Category Archives: Philosophy of Religion

Theological Determinism

Theological determinism is the view that God determines every event that occurs in the history of the world. While there is much debate about which prominent historical figures were theological determinists, St. Augustine, Thomas Aquinas, John Calvin, and Gottfried Leibniz all seemed to espouse the view at least at certain points in their illustrious careers. Contemporary theological determinists also appeal to various biblical texts (for example Ephesians 1:11) and confessional creeds (for example the Westminster Confession of Faith) to support their view. While such arguments from authority carry significant weight within the traditions in which they are offered, another form of argument for theological determinism which has broader appeal draws on perfect being theology, or a kind of systematic thinking through the implications of the claim that God is—in the words of St. Anselmquo maius cogitari non potest: that than which none greater can be conceived. The article below considers three such perfect being arguments for theological determinism, having to do with God’s knowledge of the future, providential governance of creation, and absolute independence. Implications of theological determinism for human freedom and divine responsibility are then discussed.

Reflection on theological determinism is both theoretically interesting and also practically important, especially for the lives of religious believers. On the one hand, for anyone who enjoys a good philosophical puzzle, thinking through the implications of this view offers the opportunity to consider whether various sets of propositions to which people sometimes ascribe—e.g. that God has exhaustive foreknowledge but that some events are not determined, or that God determines all events but that humans are culpable for their own sin—are in fact jointly consistent, and so what sort of systematic metaphysics is possible. On the other hand, whether all events in the world—and, in particular, personally significant events, such as the birth or death of a child, or the gain or loss of employment—are understood to be determined by God or not makes a significant difference to the attitudes that religious believers adopt and the decisions they make in response to such events in their own lives.

Table of Contents

  1. Defining Theological Determinism
  2. Arguments for Theological Determinism
    1. Divine Foreknowledge
    2. Divine Providence
    3. Divine Aseity
  3. Theological Determinism and Human Freedom
    1. Standard Compatibilism
    2. Theological-but-not-Natural Compatibilism
    3. Libertarianism
    4. Hard Determinism
  4. Theological Determinism and Divine Responsibility for Evil
    1. Theodicies and Defenses
    2. Causing vs. Permitting Evil
    3. God not a Moral Agent
    4. Sin not Blameworthy
    5. Skeptical Theism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Defining Theological Determinism

As stated above, theological determinism is the view that God determines every event that occurs in the history of the world. What it means for God to determine an event may need some spelling out. Theological determinism is often associated with Calvinist or Reformed theology, and many proponents of Calvinism put their view in terms of the specificity of God’s decree, the efficaciousness of God’s will, or the extent of God’s providential control. John Feinberg, for example, describes his theological determinist position as that view that “God’s decree covers and controls all things” (2001, p. 504), while Paul Helm, another staunch theological determinist of the Calvinist variety, simply says that God’s providence is “extended to all that He has created” (1993, p. 39). The problem with such characterizations is that they are subject to multiple interpretations, some of whom would be affirmed by theological indeterminists. For instance, a theological indeterminist might say that God’s providence extends to all events, or that even undetermined events are controlled or decreed by God in the sense that God foresees them and allows them to occur and realizes His purposes through them.

Thus one might think it better to define theological determinism in terms of divine causation, as Derk Pereboom does when he characterizes his view as “the position that God is the sufficient active cause of everything in creation, whether directly or by way of secondary causes” (2011, p. 262). The problem here is that some thinkers who seem committed to theological determinism deny that God should be considered a cause at all, at least in any univocal sense as creatures are. Herbert McCabe, for instance, maintains that when we act freely, we are not caused to act by anyone or anything other than ourselves (1987, p. 12). This is not because McCabe thinks that our free actions are undetermined by God, but because he thinks that God is not an “existent among others,” as created causes are (1987, p. 14). Thinkers like McCabe sometimes appeal to Thomas Aquinas’ doctrine of analogy in explaining their view. According to this doctrine, as Austin Farrer explains it, God’s providential activity cannot be conceived in causal terms without “degrade[ing] it to the creaturely level and plac[ing] it in the field of interacting causalities”—the results of which can only be “monstrosity and confusion” (1967, p. 62). If the views of such Thomists are to count as versions of theological determinism, then we need a way of spelling out the view in non-causal terms.

Perhaps, then, theological determinism will have to be defined in terms of God’s decree or will or control after all; but if so, these concepts will have to be defined so as to rule out indeterministic interpretations. We might, for instance, take Feinberg’s definition of an “unconditional” decree as one “based on nothing outside of God that move[s] him to choose one thing or another” (2001, p. 527) and then characterize theological determinism as the view that God unconditionally decrees every event that occurs in the history of the world. Such a view would exclude the possibility that God merely permits some events which He foresees will happen in some circumstances but which He does not Himself determine.

2. Arguments for Theological Determinism

a. Divine Foreknowledge

One of the divine attributes that has been appealed to in arguments for theological determinism is God’s knowledge of future events, or (simple) foreknowledge. Numerous biblical passages support the idea that God knows all that the future holds, including the free choices of human beings. For instance, the New Testament records Jesus’ prophesies that Judas will betray him and that Peter will deny him three times; and in the Hebrew Bible, the psalmist declares to God, “In your book were written all the days that were formed for me, when none of them as yet existed” (Psalm 29). Furthermore, if we assume that there are truths about the future to be known (a question discussed below), then exhaustive divine foreknowledge—that is, God’s foreknowledge of every future event—may be thought to follow from considerations of perfect being theology, since to not know some truth would seem to be an imperfection.

But if God knows the future exhaustively, theological determinists argue, then all future events must be determined, directly or indirectly, by God. The reasoning they offer in support of this argument can be considered in two steps. First is the claim that for a future event e to be known at some time t (say, “in the beginning”), e must be determined at or prior to t. Otherwise, there would be no truth about e to be known at t. The second claim is that if all future events are determined from the beginning of time, they must ultimately be so by God, since nothing else existed in the beginning to determine them. This is not to say that God’s knowledge is causal, in the sense that simply by knowing something, God is the cause of that thing. Rather, proponents of this line of reasoning contend that God cannot know a proposition unless it is true; and the proposition that some event will occur cannot be true at some time, unless that event is determined by that time; but then if God knows that some event will occur when nothing but God exists, it must be God Himself who ultimately determines the event’s occurrence.

Various responses to this sort of argument, for the incompatibility of divine foreknowledge and undetermined events, have been offered in the history of theology. One popular reply first made by Boethius is to deny that God knows anything at some time, since God exists outside of time altogether and knows all things from an eternal perspective. Another response, inspired by William of Ockham, is to grant the possibility of temporal divine knowledge but deny that what God foreknows must be determined by God. Alvin Plantinga (1986), for instance, has argued that creatures can have a sort of counterfactual power over God’s past knowledge, such that they make it the case that God knows what they themselves determine.

One final, more radical response to this argument is to deny that God has exhaustive foreknowledge. Defenders of open theism, who take this route, maintain that God leaves some future events undetermined, and so does not know exactly what the future holds. This is not to say that God is not omniscient. Rather, according to some open theists, propositions about undetermined events are simply not true (or false) before those events occur; or, according to others, there are true propositions about undetermined events, but they are in principle unknowable. Either way, open theists maintain that it is not a real limitation on God not to know what it is impossible to know, and so the denial of exhaustive foreknowledge is compatible with the affirmation that God is a supremely perfect being.

None of these responses to the argument for theological determinism just described are without their critics, however. In reply to the Boethian proposal, questions have been raised about the coherence of the claim that God—a personal being who acts—exists altogether outside of time. Furthermore, the appeal to divine eternality may not even solve the problem, since a parallel argument for theological determinism can be constructed on the assumption that God knows timelessly all that the future—considered from our perspective—holds. Likewise, in reply to the Ockhamist solution, some have questioned whether there is any real distinction between counterfactual power over God’s knowledge of the past and the power to bring about the past, the latter of which seems problematic if not impossible. Finally, many philosophers reject the open theist claim that there are propositions about the future that are neither true nor false, since such a claim requires the denial of the widely accepted principle of bivalence. And the alternative open theist view, that there are true propositions about the future that are unknowable by God, seems to call into question divine omniscience. Furthermore, many theists reject open theism as unorthodox and incompatible with divine sovereignty and providential care of creation—an issue to be discussed below.

b. Divine Providence

In addition to attributing to God exhaustive foreknowledge—or knowledge of all that will happen in the future—many theists are also committed to the claim (explicitly or implicitly, in virtue of other things they believe) that God has exhaustive knowledge of counterfactual conditionals, or facts about what would happen if circumstances were different than they in fact are. One famous biblical example of such knowledge is found in the Hebrew Bible, when David consults God about a rumor he has heard:

David said, “O Lord, the God of Israel, your servant has heard that Saul seeks to come to Keilah, to destroy the city on my account. And now, will Saul come down as your servant has heard?…” The Lord said, “He will come down.” Then David said, “Will the men of Keilah surrender me and my men into the hand of Saul?” The Lord said, “They will surrender you.” (1 Samuel 23: 10-12, N.R.S.V.)

Upon hearing this news, David and his men decide to leave Keilah, and thus Saul, learning that David has left, never ends up going there himself, and the men of Keilah never have the chance to surrender David to him. Thus the truths that the Lord revealed to David are of the counterfactual sort: if David had remained in Keilah, Saul would have sought him there; and if Saul had sought him there, the men of Keilah would have surrendered David to Saul.

Some philosophers have argued that exhaustive divine knowledge of such counterfactual conditionals is essential to God’s perfection—in particular, to God’s sovereignty and providential care for creation—and that such knowledge entails theological determinism. The argument has centered on what are called “counterfactuals of freedom,” or those counterfactual conditionals about what a possible created person (who may or may not ever exist) would freely do in a possible circumstance (which may or may not ever occur). The free actions in question are supposed to be libertarian, or those that are not determined, either by a prior state of the world or by God. Luis de Molina considered knowledge of such counterfactuals to be part of God’s scientia media, or middle knowledge, standing in between God’s “natural knowledge,” or knowledge of God’s own nature and the necessary truths that follow from it, and “free knowledge,” or knowledge of God’s will and the contingent truths that follow from it. Molina claimed that, like the propositions included in God’s natural knowledge, counterfactuals of freedom are pre-volitional, or (logically) prior to, and thus independent of, God’s will; though like the propositions included in God’s free knowledge, they are contingent truths.

One way to reconstruct the line of reasoning from divine knowledge of counterfactual conditionals to theological determinism is thus as follows:

  1. If there are any events in the history of the world that are not determined by God, then—contra Molina—God cannot have exhaustive knowledge of counterfactual conditionals.
  2. If God lacks exhaustive knowledge of counterfactual conditionals, then God take risks with creation.
  3. A God who takes risks with creation is not perfect.
  4. Therefore, since God is perfect, God must determine every event in the history of the world.

Robert Adams has argued in favor of the first premise, focusing in particular on the possibility of God’s knowledge of counterfactuals of freedom. Adams contends that for God to know a proposition, it must have a truth-value; but counterfactuals of freedom lack truth-values, since there is nothing that could ground their truth. While the consequent of a conditional may follow from the antecedent by logical or causal necessity, neither sort of necessity can ground the truth of a conditional about how a person would act if placed in a particular circumstance, if that action is undetermined. And features of a person that do not necessitate her action—such as her particular beliefs and desires—cannot ground the truth of counterfactual conditionals about her action, precisely because such features are non-necessitating. Adams suggests that divine foreknowledge may not face the same grounding problem as middle knowledge, since categorical predictions about undetermined events “can be true by corresponding to the actual occurrence of the event that they predict” (1987, p. 80). But in the case of counterfactual conditionals, there may never be actual events to which the propositions correspond.

Supposing Adams is right that middle knowledge is impossible, what would divine providence look like without it, on the assumption that God does not determine some events in the world? One might think that all God really needs to providentially govern the world is foreknowledge. Yet William Hasker has argued “foreknowledge without middle knowledge—simple foreknowledge—does not offer the benefits for the doctrine of providence that its adherents have sought to derive from it” (1989, p. 19). His reasoning, in brief, is that foreknowledge is about what will actually happen in the world God has created, and so will be useless to God in deciding what to create to begin with or how to arrange events throughout history for the benefit of creatures. Consider, for example, the biblical case discussed above, in which David consults God to determine the best strategy for avoiding capture by Saul. If God had only simple foreknowledge and not middle knowledge, then God could only tell David what he would in fact do, and what Saul’s response would in fact be, and not what better or worse outcomes might result from alternative courses of action. Likewise—and perhaps more worrisome—before creating the world, God could not know without middle knowledge whether, if He gave creatures the libertarian freedom to decide whether to enter a loving relationship with Him and their fellow creatures, any of them would indeed choose to do so. Thus, creating a world with such indeterministic events is risky business for God. In contrast, the view in which God determines all events of the world can be considered a risk-free view of providence.

While Hasker goes on to defend the risky view of providence, others have criticized it as inconsistent with divine perfection. Edwin Curley (2003) has argued that it involves a kind of recklessness inconsistent with the providential wisdom and concern for creatures that is supposed to be characteristic of a perfect Creator. Focusing in particular on indeterminism at the level of human action, Curley points out that a God who gave creatures libertarian freedom without knowing how they would use it would run the risk of their destroying themselves and thwarting God’s purposes for creation. Thomas Flint similarly argues for the superiority of the risk-free view of providence by means of a parental analogy. Imagine, he says, that a parent has two options for her child: under Option One, the child may struggle and seem to be in danger, but the parent will “know with certainty that she will freely develop into a good and happy human being who leads a full and satisfying life”; under Option Two, in contrast, the parent will have no idea how things will turn out for the child, and can only hope for the best. Flint says he would, without hesitation, choose Option One, and that the claim that Option Two is preferable is “just short of absurd” (1998, p. 106). Likewise, he suggests, the claim that a risk-taking God is superior to, or even on par with, a risk-avoiding one is incredible.

If the above line of reasoning is correct, then it follows that a supremely perfect God would not create a world in which events were left undetermined. However, the argument has been questioned on a number of points. With respect to Adams’ argument against the possibility of middle knowledge, at least two assumptions are open to doubt. First, it is unclear whether, for a proposition to have truth-value, there must be something that grounds its truth. Francisco Suárez, an early follower of Molina, seemed to question this claim. Richard Gaskin has as well, maintaining that there is nothing that grounds the truth of any proposition, and that to suppose otherwise “is to slide into a substantial and implausible correspondence theory of truth” (1993, pp. 424-425).

Others, granting that true propositions may need grounding, have proposed possible grounds for counterfactuals of freedom. Alvin Plantinga, for instance, has suggested a parallel between counterfactuals of freedom and propositions about past events. He writes: “Suppose… that yesterday I freely performed some action A. What was or is it that grounded or founded my doing so?… Perhaps you will say that what grounds [the truth of the proposition that I did A] is just that in fact I did A” (1985, p. 378). Plantinga responds that the same kind of answer is available in the case of counterfactuals of freedom; for what grounds such truths is the fact that certain people (actual or possible) are such that if they were put in certain circumstances, they would do certain things.

Other theists who accept that God lacks exhaustive knowledge of counterfactual conditionals question whether this entails that God lacks the sort of providential control over creation essential to His perfection. David Hunt has argued, contra Hasker, that simple foreknowledge can in fact give God a “providential advantage,” allowing Him to “secure results” that He would not be able to secure without such knowledge (2009). If with simple foreknowledge God can thus ensure His central purposes for creation, perhaps the charge that theological indeterminism entails risk-taking with respect to less significant outcomes will not have so much sting.

Alternatively, one may argue with open theists that the risky view of providence involves divine virtues such as experimentation, collaboration, responsiveness, and vulnerability, and that it is the only way to secure the great metaphysical and moral value of creatures with libertarian freedom. One way to put this latter point is in terms of Flint’s parental analogy. After noting that he would of course choose (risk-free) Option One if he could, Flint says, “the fact that we don’t have a choice here, that we as parents are stuck with [risky] Option Two, is one of the things that is especially frustrating (and even terrifying) about being a parent” (1998a, p. 106). An open theist convinced of the impossibility of middle knowledge might respond that this must similarly be what is especially frustrating (and even terrifying!) about being God—that Option One is not available, so that if God wants to create persons with libertarian freedom, He must opt for Option Two. But just as a parent still chooses to give birth to a child, so God still chooses to bring into being such creatures, because of their great value.

c. Divine Aseity

A third argument for theological determinism focuses on the divine attribute of aseity. The word aseity which comes from the Latin phrase a se—“from itself”—refers to God’s absolute independence from anything distinct from Himself. While some have taken divine aseity to be the most fundamental feature of our conception of God, others have suggested that it follows from God’s perfection, since to be dependent on another would seem to be an imperfection (Brower 2011). Closely related to the concept of divine aseity is the medieval conception of God as pure act (actus purus). What medieval thinkers meant by saying that God is pure act is that He is always complete in Himself—always “all that He can be.” In contrast, in created beings there is potentiality and passivity, meaning that they are not all that they can be, but can be changed and acted on by others.

On the basis of considerations of God’s aseity and pure actuality, Reginald Garrigou-Lagrange has offered an argument for theological determinism. For, he says, those who maintain that there are some events that God does not determine—for instance, human choices—must posit “a passivity in the pure Act. If the divine causality is not predetermining with regard to our choice... the divine knowledge is fatally determined by it. To wish to limit the universal causality and absolute independence of God, necessarily brings one to place a passivity in Him” (1936, p. 538). To illustrate his point, Garrigou-Lagrange asks us to imagine that when God gives two men grace to fight temptation, one cooperates with this grace while the other does not, but that the difference between their responses is not determined by God. Supposing that God can foreknow the two men’s responses to His grace, theological indeterminists must admit that “the foreknowledge is passive,” just as a person’s knowledge is passive when she is a mere spectator to some event (1936, pp. 538-539). What Garrigou-Lagrange seems to mean by this suggestive phrasing is that God’s intellect would be passive, in the sense that in coming to know what the two men will do, God’s intellect would be acted upon by something outside of it. Garrigou-Lagrange concludes:

God is either determining or determined, there is no other alternative. His knowledge of free conditional futures is measured by things, or else it measures them by reason of the accompanying decree of the divine will. Our salutary choices, as such, in the intimacy of their free determination, depend upon God, or it is He, the sovereignly independent pure Act, who depends upon us. (1936, p. 546)

In response to this argument for theological determinism, Eleonore Stump contends that the dilemma presented by Garrigou-Lagrange—that God either determines or is determined—is a false one, if determination is taken to be equivalent to causation. She offers examples of both divine and human knowledge in which the knower neither determines what she knows, nor is determined by it. On the human side, a person might know that an animal is a substance, but the human obviously does not determine this truth. And (on Thomas Aquinas’ view of human cognition—which Garrigou-Lagrange would presumably accept) neither is the human rendered passive, or determined in her knowledge of this truth, since the human intellect’s operations are active in the process of deriving it, and nothing acts on the intellect “with causal efficacy” in this process. Likewise, on the divine side, God presumably knows of His own existence without determining that He exists; but neither, presumably, is God determined in His knowledge of this truth (2003, pp. 120-121).

One thing to note about the examples offered by Stump—of a human knowing that an animal is a substance, or of God knowing that He exists—is that the truths known are in both cases necessary. One question that a theological determinist might raise is whether, when it comes to knowledge of contingent events, the indeterminist can likewise maintain that the knower neither determines nor is determined by what she knows. While our coming to know necessary truths on the basis of, say, complex mathematical reasoning would seem to be quite an active process, our coming to know contingent truths on the basis of some very clear and distinct perception—say, that we have hands—would seem to be more passive. If this is right, then the theological determinist might maintain that if God’s knowledge of undetermined future events is quasi-perceptual, then God might indeed be rendered passive by such knowledge. Furthermore, even if the theological indeterminist can defend a conception of divine foreknowledge on which God is not determined by some of what He knows, in the sense that He is not caused to know some truths, it is very hard to see how He would not in some sense be dependent on something outside of Himself for that knowledge. The question for theological indeterminists is whether this sense of dependency is compatible with a conception of God as supremely perfect.

3. Theological Determinism and Human Freedom

So far we have considered arguments that theological determinists have put forward in support of their view of divine providence, as well as some objections raised to these arguments. Critics of theological determinism not only object to the positive reasons offered in favor of the view, but also to certain negative implications. One major issue theological determinists must grapple with is how there can be any creaturely freedom in a world in which all events are determined by God. The claim that at least some creatures are both free and responsible for their actions is a central part of traditional Western theisms—Judaism, Christianity, and Islam—and most contemporary theological determinists affirm this claim, though as we will see, some within these traditions dissent from it. Below, several theological deterministic conceptions of human freedom are discussed.

a. Standard Compatibilism

Perhaps the most common conception of free will espoused by theological determinists is the standard compatibilist one: that determinism of any sort—whether theological (that is, determination by God) or natural (that is, determination by antecedent events in accordance with the laws of nature)–does not automatically rule out free will. Theological determinists espousing this view often appeal to secular theories of freedom and arguments for the compatibility of such freedom with natural determinism to support their claim that theological determinism is also compatible with free will. For instance, according to the classic compatibilist position defended by Thomas Hobbes, a person is free to the extent that she finds no impediment to doing what she wants or wills to do.

Contemporary compatibilists, recognizing the limitations of this position—for example that it allows for actions resulting from brainwashing to be free—have offered various refinements, such as that, in addition to being able to do what one wants or wills to do, one must act with sensitivity to certain rational considerations (the reasons-responsive view), or one must have the will one wants to have (the hierarchical model). One proponent of the latter view is Lynn Rudder Baker. According to Baker, “Person S has compatibilist free will for a choice or action if:

    1. S wills X,
    2. S wants to will X,
    3. S wills X because she wants to will X, and
    4. S would still have willed X even if she (herself) had known the provenance of her wanting to will X.” (2003, p. 467)

Baker notes that her account is compatibilist in the sense that “a person S’s having free will with respect to an action (or choice) A is compatible with A’s being caused ultimately by factors outside of S’s control.” She makes no distinction, with respect to the question of an agent’s freedom, whether the agent’s action is caused “by God or by natural events” (2003, pp. 460-461). More generally, theological determinists point out that on all such contemporary compatibilist accounts of free will, divine determination does not automatically rule out human freedom, since none of these accounts specifies what must be true of the first causes of human volition and action. This lack of specificity, however, is precisely the problem that incompatibilists—those who hold that determinism of any sort is incompatible with determinism—find with the compatibilist position. They reason that if either God or events of the distant past are the ultimate causes of our actions, then our actions are not under our control. The debate between compatibilists and incompatibilists has a long history, and is ongoing. See “Free Will for a more in-depth summary.

b. Theological-but-not-Natural Compatibilism

While many theological determinists take the standard compatibilist line, some differentiate between natural and theological determinism, and maintain that only the latter is compatible with free will. Defenders of this position, who might be called “theological-but-not-natural-compatibilists,” appeal to a number of differences between theological and natural determinism to support their view. Hugh McCann, for instance, argues that in contrast to the way in which events that we bring about come to pass, “the manner in which our actions come to pass is not one in which God acts upon us or does anything to us” (2005, p. 145). McCann maintains that God’s causing our actions is like an author’s creating the characters of a novel. He writes: “The author of a novel never makes her creatures do something; she only makes them doing it. It is the same between us and God” (2005, p. 146).

McCann should not be interpreted as denying theological determinism here—that is, as saying that God does not determine what creatures do, but only what they are. Rather, he means that, unlike creatures who can only make other creatures do things, God has the unique ability to make creatures themselves; and rather than first bringing creatures into being, and then making them do certain things, God by one and the same act makes creatures doing the things they do. McCann contends that because of such differences between divine and creaturely causation, theological determinism “does not endanger our freedom” as natural determinism does (2005, p. 146).

However, theological compatibilism, like its natural counterpart, has been criticized by standard incompatibilists. One of the most influential arguments for the incompatibility of causal determinism and human freedom—the Consequence argument—relies on the premise that, in a deterministic world, the ultimate causes of our actions are events of the distant past. The reason why this is considered a problem, though, is simply that such causes lie outside of our control. So if the Consequence argument establishes the incompatibility of free will and natural determinism, a parallel argument appealing to the fact that God’s will, taken as a determining cause, likewise lies outside of our control should establish the incompatibility of free will and theological determinism. To put the point differently, it seems that those who hold that God’s determination of our actions is both causal, and compatible with human freedom, ought to be standard compatibilists about determinism and free will, rather than theological-but-not-natural compatibilists, since the differentiating features of natural determining causes pose no additional threat to free will, once one accepts that God’s determining causation is compatible with human freedom.

c. Libertarianism

While the theological determinists described above, who maintain that theological determinism is compatible with human freedom while natural determinism is not, suggest various differences between divine and natural determination, they still recognize God’s determination as a species of causation. As mentioned already, however, some who seem to espouse theological determinism deny that God should be considered a cause at all, at least in any univocal sense as creatures are. Writing in this tradition, Michael Hoonhout applauds Aquinas for intentionally discussing the doctrine of divine providence twice in his Summa Theologiae—first in the context of “the essence of God” and then in the context of “the nature of creation”—in recognition of “two radically different orders of intelligibility.” He maintains that “double affirmations which seemingly contradict each other are to be expected” if we respect the integrity of each order (2002, pp. 4-6).

The seemingly contradictory “double affirmations” to which Hoonhout refers are that God determines everything that occurs in the world, and that humans have a non-deterministic form of freedom. Thus one finds some theologians who seem clearly committed to theological determinism when considering the order of the Creator, speaking of the possibility of libertarian human freedom in the context of the order of creation. Kathyrn Tanner, for instance, maintains a view of divine causation as absolute in terms of both its range (“all inclusive or universally extensive”) and its efficacy (“cannot be hindered, diverted, or otherwise redirected by creatures”). Tanner claims that since “God does not bring about the human agent’s choice by intervening in the created order as some sort of supernatural cause,” one can “still affirm a very strong libertarian version of the human being’s freedom” (1994, pp. 113, 125, 126).

The trouble with such a view, however, is that it seems to face a dilemma. On the one hand, if the way in which God determines events in the world is really nothing like the way creaturely causes do, such that even fundamental concepts like conditional necessity do not apply to the relationship between God’s causal activity and its effects, then, as Thomas Tracy points out (1994), analogy collapses into equivocation, and we are left without any idea of what theological determinism is supposed to mean. On the other hand, if such fundamental concepts do apply to divine causation in something like the way they apply to creaturely causation, then arguments against the compatibility of theological determinism and human freedom must be considered and responded to, rather than simply dismissed as involving a confusion of categories.

d. Hard Determinism

One final position that theological determinists may adopt on the issue of human freedom is the standard incompatibilist one, admitting that determinism of any sort is incompatible with free will and thus that there can be no creaturely freedom. This view, called hard theological determinism, has historically won few adherents, in part because of the centrality of the belief in human freedom to so much civic and religious life. On the civic side, the assumption of free will has been thought to underwrite reactive attitudes such as resentment, indignation, gratitude, and love, and the moral and legal practices of praise and blame, reward and punishment. On the religious side, human freedom has seemed crucial to the logic of divine commandment and judgment, and to such reactive attitudes and practices as guilt, repentance, and forgiveness.

However, some hard theological determinists have challenged such assumptions about the centrality of free will. Derk Pereboom, for instance, has argued that, while theological determinism is not compatible with the basic sense of desert (that is, deserving praise or blame simply because of the moral status of what one has done) it is compatible with judgments of value (for example, that behavior is good or bad), as well as the reactive attitudes and practices which are most central to traditional theism, and which might seem to presuppose basic desert. For instance, a person without free will might still recognize that she has failed to act according to the principles she believes she should live by, and so experience guilt; or, she might resolve to no longer hold another’s past behavior as a reason to remain at odds with him, and so forgive. Pereboom suggests that God’s commanding and judging, rewarding and punishing may serve the moral formation of creatures even without free will, and so may be justified without it. However, some critics have questioned whether such religiously significant attitudes and practices as repentance and the resolution to amend one’s life can really be secured without a sense of either basic desert or the sort of agential control which hard theological determinists deny. Furthermore, even if hard theological determinism is compatible with such attitudes and practices central to theistic traditions, it is another question whether the denial of free will and moral responsibility in the basic-desert sense is itself compatible with the teachings of these religions. One question that remains for hard Christian determinists, for example, is how to make sense of the many New Testament passages that discuss the freedom found in Christ (cf. Galatians 5:1, 2 Corinthians 3:17).

4. Theological Determinism and Divine Responsibility for Evil

Besides explaining how, on their view, humans can be free and responsible for their own actions (or how the denial of human freedom is compatible with traditional theism), theological determinists must also face questions about God’s moral responsibility for the evil in the world that, on their view, He determines. As with the former issue, their responses to the latter are many and varied. Below a number of distinct responses are discussed.

a. Theodicies and Defenses

Some theists attempt to offer a theodicy, or plausible explanation of why God has created a world in which evil exists. Others, uncertain of what God’s actual reasons are, propose instead a defense, or possible explanation. One historic and popular explanation of why evil exists in a world created by God is the free will defense, first proposed by St. Augustine and developed by Alvin Plantinga (1974). According to this defense, the evil we witness in God’s creation is not in fact God’s doing at all, but the result of humans’ misuse of their own freedom: God created humans to live in harmony with Himself and each other, but they freely chose to rebel against God and to sin against one another. Some proponents of this defense extend it to explain natural as well as moral evil, suggesting that all suffering in the world is ultimately due to sinful choices of fallen creatures, some of which lie behind the destructive natural forces of the world. However, the free will defense seems to assume that it was impossible for God both to create free persons and to determine all of their actions, such that they never do evil. In other words, it seems to assume an indeterministic conception of human freedom incompatible with theological determinism. Thus, the traditional free will defense would not seem to be an option for theological determinists.

Some compatibilists have argued, however, that the free will defense need not presuppose an indeterministic conception of human freedom. Jason Turner, for instance, suggests that if “free actions can be determined but must not be dependent on another’s will”—a view he calls “independent compatibilism”—then the free will defense may still be open to theological determinists (2003, p. 131). On independent compatibilism, whether God could create a world with free persons who were determined in their actions and never committed moral evil depends on whether God would create such a world because the persons never committed evil, or for some other reason. Supposing that the reason God would create a world in which persons who were determined in their actions never committed moral evil was indeed because they never committed evil, their actions would be dependent on God’s will, and so would not be free.

While there thus may be some versions of the free will defense open to the theological determinist, such versions require metaphysical assumptions that may seem implausible—for instance, that events in the causal history of an agent’s action occurring before she was even born may determine whether her (determined) actions are free or not, and that whether an event depends on God’s will in a freedom-undermining way depends on what God’s reasons were for causing it. Still, theological determinists may argue that even the traditional indeterministic version of the free will defense is implausible, and that more plausible explanations of evil are available. John Hick, for instance, contends that, given a modern understanding of evolutionary theory, the claim that humans were created perfect and fell from grace is an incredible one. Inspired by the writings of St. Irenaeus, Hick proposes instead the soul-making theodicy, according to which God created imperfect creatures in a world in which they are prone to suffering and sin. He argues that it is not the freedom of creatures, per se, which is so valuable as to outweigh these evils, but rather their development, morally and spiritually, through struggle, suffering, trial and temptation, and the virtuous characters which result from “the investment of costly personal effort” (2010, p. 256). While Hick is himself committed to theological indeterminism, his basic theodicy is compatible with theological determinism as well.

Two other theodicies that theological determinists have adopted likewise focus on the value of development or process. Eleonore Stump has suggested that a world of sin and suffering is “most conducive” to bringing about both humans’ willingness to receive the gift of salvation from God and also their subsequent sanctification (1985, p. 409). While Stump holds that human freedom is incompatible with theological (and natural) determinism, and that receiving the gift of salvation and undergoing the process of sanctification both require free will, Derk Pereboom contends that “no feature of [her] account demands libertarian freedom, nor even a notion of free will of the sort required for moral responsibility… It is sufficient that this change [the turning to God on the occasion of suffering] is seriously valuable, and that it results in more intimate relationship with God” (2015). Marilyn McCord Adams, likewise, has proposed that participating in evil might facilitate creatures’ identification with Christ and union with God (1999). Such work on theodicy has drawn on specifically Christian conceptions of God and the human good, and advanced them in innovative ways. Yet, these proposals raise many questions about the value of processdeveloping moral character, becoming sanctified, or coming to identify with God—as well as the comparative value of such processes with the disvalue of the sin and suffering that make them possible.

b. Causing vs. Permitting Evil

Even supposing the disvalue of all sin and suffering in the world is outweighed by the value of the moral development of creatures, another concern critics have raised is whether it is morally permissible for God to cause humans to sin in order to realize some good. Peter Byrne, in response to Paul Helm’s deterministic theodicy, asks:

How does it square with the Pauline injunction that one should not do evil that good may come of it? The place of that injunction in traditional moral theology is to set limits to how far we can pursue good by way of doing evil as its precondition. There are some acts that are so heinous that one may not do them for the sake of the bringing about a greater good…. One may not murder that good may come of it. But Helm’s God has precisely planned, purposed, and necessitated acts of murder and instances of other kinds of horrendous wickedness so that good may come of them. (2008, p. 200)

In response, some theological determinists have argued that the difference between God’s causing humans to commit sin for the purpose of realizing some good (the theological determinist’s view), and knowing that humans would sin if they were created in particular circumstances and choosing to create them in those circumstances anyway, for the purpose of realizing some good (the Molinist view), is morally insignificant. Indeed, theological determinists contend, even the open theist’s view, according to which God allows horrendous evil that He could prevent—presumably for the purpose of realizing some good—raises similar questions about God’s moral responsibility for evil. So, they maintain, this concern about divine responsibility should not be a reason to reject theological determinism in favor of such competing views of divine providence.

c. God not a Moral Agent

While some theological determinists offer theodicies or defenses in attempt to demonstrate that there is some actual or possible reason for evil which morally justifies God in creating it, others eschew such explanations altogether. Some argue that they are unnecessary, on the grounds God cannot, in principle, be morally responsible for anything, since He is above or beyond morality altogether. One line of argument for this conclusion is based on the idea that morality depends on God’s will and command, and that God is not Himself subject to the commandments that He establishes. Morality, on this view, only applies to creatures, over which God has ultimate moral authority. One problem facing such a divine command theory of morality is the familiar Euthyphro problem—that if God’s commandments determine the content of morality, then morality is arbitrary, such that what is right might have been wrong and vice versa if God had willed that it be so. Another implication of this argument that many theists find difficult to accept is that, if God cannot in principle be morally blameworthy since He is above morality, then He cannot be morally praiseworthy either.

d. Sin not Blameworthy

An alternative response to the question of how God could not be blameworthy for causing humans to sin is the hard theological determinist one. As discussed above, hard theological determinists maintain that, since God causes all events in creation, humans are not free or morally responsible in the basic desert sense. As Derk Pereboom notes, it follows on this view that since humans are not blameworthy for their actions, God is not the cause of blameworthy actions. Thus, God’s causing human sin is more similar to His causing natural evils, such as animal predation and its associated sufferings, than it is to His causing moral evils, traditionally understood. Since most theists agree that God has control over all such natural forces, the problem of natural evil poses no more difficulty for the theological determinist than for the theological indeterminist. However, this hard deterministic response to the problem of moral evil is compatible with the offering of a theodicy or defense particular to human sin, as well as with the appeal to skeptical theism discussed below.

e. Skeptical Theism

One final response to the problem of evil that theological determinists make is to admit that they are unable to think of reasons that would justify God in creating a world with the sort and extent of evil that we see, but nevertheless to maintain that such an inability should not be taken as good evidence that there is no divine justification for evil. This is the response offered by skeptical theists, so named because of their skepticism about their own ability to discern God’s reasons for creating and governing the world as He does. Several lines of reasoning have been offered for this position, ranging from arguments from analogy, likening the cognitive distance between us and God to that between a very young child and her parents, to arguments focusing on the massive complexity of the causal networks in the world, and our inability to comprehend how actual and possible goods and evils are connected. The view has also been subject to various objections, regarding purported negative implications of the view for theological knowledge and trust in God, and moral deliberation and action. The debate regarding these issues is ongoing, and the interested reader should see Skeptical Theism for more information.

While skeptical theism is a response to the problem of evil available to theological determinists and indeterminists alike, theological determinists who embrace the view must grapple with further issues. Like those offering a theodicy or defense, theological determinists who maintain their justified ignorance of God’s reasons must still come to terms with the fact that, on their view, evil is not merely permitted but determined by God. This would seem to lead to a sort of double-mindedness specifically about the value of moral evil in the world. It is, after all, central to religious practice to strive to see the events in one’s life from God’s perspective, and to value them as God would, in His wisdom and benevolence. Thus, if some horrendous evil—say, severe child abuse—is divinely determined, then one ought to strive to accept, and even embrace it as instrumental to God’s purposes and so for the greater good. Such an attempt, however, would seem to be in serious tension with a teaching central to the traditional theism, that moral evil is opposed by God, and should be opposed by humans as well.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord (1999). Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
    • Contains proposal that experience of evil might facilitate humans’ identification with Christ and union with God.
  • Adams, Robert (1987). “Middle Knowledge and the Problem of Evil.” The Virtue of Faith and Other Essays in Philosophical Theology. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Raises grounding objection against the possibility of middle knowledge.
  • Baker, Lynn Rudder (2003). “Why Christians Should Not Be Libertarians: An Augustinian Challenge.” Faith and Philosophy, Vol. 20 No. 4, pp. 460-478.
    • Argues for compatibilism on the basis of tradition, and offers standard compatibilist account of free will.
  • Basinger, David and Randall Basinger (1986). Predestination and Free Will: Four Views of Divine Sovereignty and Human Freedom. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
    • Contains discussion of how embracing theological determinism might shape one’s personal deliberations and decision-making.
  • Boethius (1969). The Consolation of Philosophy. Trans. V. E. Watts. New York: Penguin Books.
    • Contains proposal of divine timelessness as resolution to the problem of divine foreknowledge and human freedom.
  • Brower, Jeffrey (2011). “Simplicity and Aseity.” The Oxford Handbook of Philosophical Theology. Ed. Flint, Thomas and Michael Rea. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Defines aseity and summarizes argument for theological determinism on the basis of aseity.
  • Byrne, Peter (2008). “Helm’s God and the Authorship of Sin.” Reason, Faith and History: Philosophical Essays for Paul Helm. Ed. M. W. F. Stone. Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
    • Raises concern that Helm’s theological determinism commits him to the claim that God “plans, purposes, and values moral evil.”
  • Curley, Edwin (2003). “The Incoherence of Christian Theism.” The Harvard Review of Philosophy, Vol. 11, pp. 74-100.
    • Contains argument that the risky view of providence is incompatible with divine wisdom and care for creation.
  • Farrer, Austin (1967). Faith and Speculation. London: A. and C. Black.
    • Explicates the doctrine of analogy and its implications for the “paradox” of divine agency and human freedom.
  • Feinberg, John S. (2001). No One Like Him. Wheaton, IL: Crossway Books.
    • Defends theological determinism on biblical, theological, and philosophical grounds, and responds to a number of objections to the view.
  • Flint, Thomas (1998). Divine Providence: The Molinist Account. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
    • Contains argument for superiority of the risk-free over the risky view of providence.
  • Gaskin, Richard (1993). “Conditionals of Freedom and Middle Knowledge.” The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 43, No. 173, pp. 412-430.
    • Argues against claim that counterfactuals of freedom need grounds.
  • Garrigou-Lagrange, R. (1936). God, His Existence and His Nature: A Thomistic Solution of Certain Agnostic Antinomies, Vol. 2. Trans. Rose, Dom Bebe. London: B. Herder Book Co.
    • Contains argument for theological determinism on the basis of God’s aseity.
  • Hasker, William (1985). “Foreknowledge and Necessity,” Faith and Philosophy, Vol. 2 No. 2, pp. 121-156.
    • Criticizes Plantinga’s distinction between counterfactual power over the past and the power to bring about the past.
  • Hasker, William (1989). God, Time and Knowledge. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
    • Contains argument that simple foreknowledge is providentially useless to God.
  • Helm, Paul (1993). The Providence of God. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
    • Contains arguments for the “risk-free” view of providence on the basis of divine knowledge and goodness.
  • Hick, John (2010). Evil and the God of Love. New York: Harper and Row.
    • Contains explication and defense of the soul-making theodicy.
  • Hoonhout, Michael (2002). “Grounding Providence in the Theology of the Creator: The Exemplarity of Thomas Aquinas.” The Heythrop Journal, Vol. 43, No. 1, pp. 1-19.
    • Defends Aquinas’ seemingly contradictory “double affirmations” of divine causation and human freedom.
  • Hunt, David (2009). “The Providential Advantage of Divine Foreknowledge.” Arguing about Religion. Ed. Timpe, Kevin. New York: Routledge, pp. 374-385.
    • Argues that simple foreknowledge enables God to secure results that He would not be able to secure without it.
  • McCann, Hugh (2005). “The Author of Sin?” Faith and Philosophy Vol. 22. No. 2, pp. 144-159.
    • Argues that theological determinism does not endanger human freedom, as natural determinism does, and that God cannot do moral wrong, since morality is grounded in divine commands.
  • Pereboom, Derk (2011). “Theological Determinism and Divine Providence.” Molinism: The Contemporary Debate. Ed. Ken Perszyk. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 262-280.
    • Defends compatibility of hard theological determinism and traditional theism.
  • Pereboom, Derk (2015). “Libertarianism and Theological Determinism.” Free Will and Theism: Connections, Contingencies, and Concerns. Ed. Timpe, Kevin and Dan Speak. Under contract with Oxford University Press.
    • Offers response to the problem of evil compatible with hard theological determinism.
  • Plantinga, Alvin (1974). God, Freedom, and Evil. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
    • Develops a free will defense.
  • Plantinga, Alvin (1985). “Reply to Robert M. Adams.” Alvin Plantinga (Profiles. Vol. 5). Ed. Tomberlin, James and Peter van Inwagen. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 371-382.
    • Contains proposal of possible grounds for counterfactuals of freedom.
  • Plantinga, Alvin (1986). “On Ockham’s Way Out.” Faith and Philosophy, Vol. 3 No. 3, pp. 235–269.
    • Defends claim that humans have counterfactual power over God’s past knowledge.
  • Rogers, Katherin (2000). Perfect Being Theology. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
    • Considers implications of the description of God as “that than which none greater can be conceived.”
  • Stump, Eleonore (1985). “The Problem of Evil.” Faith and Philosophy Vol. 2 No. 4, pp. 392-423.
    • Contains proposal that sin and suffering facilitate human acceptance of saving grace and process of sanctification.
  • Stump, Eleonore (2003). Aquinas. New York: Routledge.
    • Contains response to argument for theological determinism on the basis of divine aseity.
  • Tanner, Kathryn (1994). “Human Freedom, Human Sin, and God the Creator.” The God Who Acts: Philosophical and Theological Explorations. Ed. Thomas Tracy. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 111-135.
    • Argues for the compatibility of universal divine causation and libertarian human freedom.
  • Tracy, Thomas (1994). “Divine Action, Created Causes, and Human Freedom.” The God Who Acts: Philosophical and Theological Explorations. Ed. Thomas Tracy. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 77-102.
    • Contains critique of attempt to hold together theological determinism and libertarian human freedom.
  • Turner, Jason (2013). “Compatibilism and the Free Will Defense.” Faith and Philosophy. Vol. 30, No. 2, pp. 125-137.
    • Offers version of free will defense compatible with theological determinism.
  • Vicens, Leigh (2012). “Divine Determinism, Human Freedom, and the Consequence Argument.” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 71:2, pp. 145-155.
    • Argues that if natural determinism is incompatible with human freedom, so is theological determinism.
  • Zagzebski, Linda (2011). “Eternity and Fatalism.” God, Eternity, and Time. Ed. Christian Tapp. Aldershot: Ashgate Press.
    • Argues that appeals to divine timelessness do not solve the problem of how divine foreknowledge is compatible with our ability to do otherwise. A parallel point can be made about the problem of how divine foreknowledge is compatible with indeterminism.


Author Information

Leigh Vicens
Augustana College
U. S. A.

David Hume: Religion

David HumeDavid Hume (1711-1776) was called “Saint David” and “The Good David” by his friends, but his adversaries knew him as “The Great Infidel.” His contributions to religion have had a lasting impact and contemporary significance. Taken individually, Hume gives novel insights into many aspects of revealed and natural theology. When taken together, however, they provide his attempt at a systematic undermining of the justifications for religion. Religious belief is often defended through revealed theology, natural theology, or pragmatic advantage. However, through Hume’s various philosophical writings, he works to critique each of these avenues of religious justification.

Though Hume’s final view on religion is not clear, what is certain is that he was not a theist in any traditional sense. He gives a sweeping argument that we are never justified in believing testimony that a miracle has occurred, because the evidence for uniform laws of nature will always be stronger. If correct, this claim would undermine the veracity of any sacred text, such as the Bible, which testifies to miracles and relies on them as its guarantor of truth. As such, Hume rejects the truth of any revealed religion, and further shows that, when corrupted with inappropriate passions, religion has harmful consequences to both morality and society. Further, he argues, rational arguments cannot lead us to a deity. Hume develops what are now standard objections to the analogical design argument by insisting that the analogy is drawn only from limited experience, making it impossible to conclude that a cosmic designer is infinite, morally just, or a single being. Nor can we use such depictions to inform other aspects of the world, such as whether there is a dessert-based afterlife. He also defends what is now called “the Problem of Evil,” namely, that the concept of an all powerful, all knowing, and all good God is inconsistent with the existence of suffering.

Lastly, Hume is one of the first philosophers to systematically explore religion as a natural phenomenon, suggesting how religious belief can arise from natural, rather that supernatural means.

Table of Contents

  1. Hume’s Publications on Religious Belief
  2. Interpretations of Hume’s View
  3. Miracles
  4. Immortality of the Soul
  5. The Design Argument
  6. The Cosmological Argument
  7. The Problem of Evil
  8. The Psychology of Religious Belief
  9. The Harms of Religion
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Hume’s Works on Religion
    2. Works in the History of Philosophy

1. Hume’s Publications on Religious Belief

Hume is one of the most important philosophers to have written in the English language, and many of his writings address religious subjects either directly or indirectly. His very first work had the charge of atheism leveled against it, and this led to his being passed over for the Chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Edinburgh. In fact, Hume’s views on religion were so controversial that he never held a university position in philosophy.

Hume addressed most of the major issues within the philosophy of religion, and even today theists feel compelled to confront Hume’s challenges. He leveled moral, skeptical, and pragmatic objections against both popular religion and the religion of the philosophers. These run the gamut from highly specific topics, such as metaphysical absurdities entailed by the Real Presence of the Eucharist, to broad critiques like the impossibility of using theology to infer anything about the world.

Hume’s very first work, A Treatise of Human Nature, includes considerations against an immortal soul, develops a system of morality independent of a deity, attempts to refute occasionalism, and argues against a necessary being, to name but a few of the religious topics that it addresses. Hume’s Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding re-emphasizes several of the challenges from the Treatise, but also includes a section against miracles and a section against the fruitfulness of theology. Hume’s major non-philosophical work, The History of England, discusses specific religious sects, largely in terms of their (often bloody) consequences. He also wrote numerous essays discussing various aspects of religion, such as the anti-doctrinal essays “Of the Immortality of the Soul” and “Of Suicide,” and critiques of organized religion and the clergy in “Of Superstition and Enthusiasm” and “Of National Characters.” Hume also wrote two major works entirely dedicated to religion: The Natural History of Religion (Natural History) and the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (Dialogues), which merit brief discussions of their own.

Hume wrote the Natural History roughly in tandem with the first draft of the Dialogues, but while the former was published during his lifetime (as one of his Four Dissertations), the latter was not. In the introduction to the Natural History, Hume posits that there are two types of inquiry to be made into religion: its foundations in reason and its origin in human nature. While the Dialogues investigate the former, the task of the Natural History is to explore the latter. In the Natural History, he focuses on how various passions can give rise to common or false religion. It is an innovative work that brings together threads from philosophy, psychology, and history to provide a naturalistic account of how the various world religions came about.

Though Hume began writing the Dialogues at roughly the same time as the Natural History, he ultimately arranged to have the former published posthumously. In the twenty-five years between the time at which he first wrote them and his death, the Dialogues underwent three sets of revisions, including a final revision from his deathbed. The Dialogues are a rich discussion of Natural Theology, and are generally considered to be the most important book ever written on the subject. Divided into twelve parts, the Dialogues follow the discussion of three thinkers debating the nature of God. Of the three characters, Philo takes up the role of the skeptic, Demea represents the orthodox theologian of Hume’s day, and Cleanthes follows a more philosophical, empirical approach to his theology. The work is narrated by Pamphilus, a professed student of Cleanthes.

Both Hume’s style and the fact of posthumous publication give rise to interpretive difficulties. Stylistically, Hume’s Dialogues are modeled after On the Nature of the Gods, a dialogue by the Roman philosopher Cicero. In Circero’s works, unlike the dialogues of Plato, Leibniz, and Berkeley, a victor is not established from the outset, and all characters make important contributions. Hume ridicules such one-sided dialogues on the grounds that they put “nothing but Nonsense into the Mouth of the Adversary” (L1, Letter 72). The combination of this stylistic preference with Hume’s use of irony, an infrequently discussed but frequently employed literary device in his writings, makes the work a delight to read, but creates interpretive difficulties in determining who speaks for Hume on any given topic.

In the Dialogues, all the characters make good Humean points, even Pamphilus and Demea. The difficulty comes in determining who speaks for Hume when the characters disagree. Hume has been interpreted as Cleanthes/Pamphilus, Philo, an amalgamation, and as none of them. The most popular view, though not without dissent, construes Hume as Philo. Philo certainly has the most to say in the Dialogues. His arguments and objections often go unanswered, and he espouses many opinions on both religion and on other philosophical topics that Hume endorses in other works, such as the hypothesis that causal inference is based on custom. The more significant challenge to interpreting Hume as Philo concerns the collection of remarks at the beginning of Part XII of the Dialogues, known as Philo’s Reversal. After spending the bulk of the Dialogues raising barrage of objections against the design argument, Part XII has Philo admitting, “A purpose, an intention, a design strikes everywhere the most careless, the most stupid thinker…” (D 12.2). Nonetheless, whether Philo’s Reversal is sincere or not is fundamentally tied to Hume’s own views on religion.

2. Interpretations of Hume’s View

Given the comprehensive critique that Hume levels against religion, it is clear that he is not a theist in any traditional sense. However, acknowledging this point does little to settle Hume’s considered views on religion. There remain three positions open to Hume: atheist naturalism, skeptical agnosticism, or some form of deism. The first position has Hume denying any form of supernaturalism, and is much more popular outside of Hume scholarship than within. The reason for this is that it runs contrary to Hume’s attitude regarding speculative metaphysics. It has him making a firm metaphysical commitment by allowing an inference from our having no good reason for thinking that there are supernatural entities, to a positive commitment that in fact there are none. However, Hume would not commit the Epistemic Fallacy and thereby allow the inference from “x is all we can know of subject y” to “x constitutes the real, mind-independent essence of y.” Indeed, in Part XII of the first Enquiry, Hume explicitly denies the inference from what we can know from our ideas to what is the case in reality.

These considerations against a full-fledged atheist position motivate the skeptical view. While atheism saddles Hume with too strong a metaphysical commitment, the skeptical view also holds that he does not affirm the existence of any supernatural entities. This view has Hume doubting the existence of supernatural entities, but still allowing their possibility. It has the advantage of committing Hume to the sparse ontology of the naturalist without actually committing him to potentially dogmatic metaphysical positions. Hence, Hume can be an atheist for all intents and purposes without actually violating his own epistemic principles.

Both the atheist and skeptical interpretations must, then, take Philo’s Reversal as insincere. Perhaps Hume feared the political consequences of publically denouncing theism; alternatively, he may have used Philo’s Reversal simply as a dialectical tool of the Dialogues. Many scholars tend to steer clear of the former for several reasons. First, while it was true that, early in his career, Hume edited his work to avoid giving offense, this was not the case later. For example, Hume excised the miracles argument from the Treatise, but it later found its way into print in the Enquiry. Second, Hume arranged to have the Dialogues published after his death, and therefore had no reason to fear repercussions for himself. Further, Hume did not seem to think that the content would bring grief to his nephew who brought it to publication, as he revealed in a letter to his publisher (L2, Appendix M). Third, it is not only in the Dialogues that we get endorsements of a deity or of a design argument. J.C.A. Gaskin (1988: 219) provides an extensive (though not exhaustive) list of several other places in which we get similar pro-deistic endorsements from Hume. Lastly, it is generally considered hermeneutically appropriate to invoke disingenuousness only if an alternative interpretation cannot be plausibly endorsed.

Norman Kemp Smith, in his commentary on the Dialogues, argues in favor of just such an alternative interpretation. Though he interprets Hume as Philo, he has the Reversal as insincerely made, not from fear, but as a dialectical tool. In his Ciceronian dialogue, Hume does not want the reader, upon finishing the piece, to interpret any of the characters as victorious, instead encouraging them to reflect further upon these matters. Thus, Philo’s Reversal is part of a “dramatic balance” intended to help mask the presence of a clear victor.

Nelson Pike, in his own commentary on the Dialogues, roundly criticizes Kemp Smith’s position. We should instead look for reasons to take the Reversal as genuine. One possibility he considers is the presence of the “irregular arguments” of Part III. Here, instead of presenting design arguments based on standard analogical reasoning, Cleanthes presents considerations in which design will, “immediately flow in upon you with a force like that of sensation” (D 3.7). Pike therefore interprets these “irregular arguments” as non-inferential. If this is right, and the idea of a designer comes upon us naturally rather than inferentially, as Ronald Butler, Stanley Tweyman, and others have argued, then Philo’s Reversal is not a reversal at all. He can consistently maintain that the inference of the design argument is insufficient for grounding one’s belief in God, and that nonetheless, we have a natural inclination to accept it.

There is, therefore, support for interpreting Hume as a deist of a limited sort. Gaskin calls this Hume’s “attenuated deism,” attenuated in that the analogy to something like human intelligence is incredibly remote, and that no morality of the deity is implied, due especially to the Problem of Evil. However, scholars that attribute weak deism to Hume are split in regard to the source of the belief. Some, like Gaskin, think that Hume’s objections to the design argument apply only to analogies drawn too strongly. Hence, Hume does not reject all design arguments, and , provided that the analogs are properly qualified, might allow the inference. This is different than the picture suggested by Butler and discussed by Pike in which the belief is provided by a natural, non-rational faculty and thereby simply strikes us, rather than as the product of an inferential argument. Therefore, though the defenders of a deistic Hume generally agree about the remote, non-moral nature of the deity, there is a fundamental schism regarding the justification and generation of this belief. Both sides, however, agree that the belief should not come from special revelation, such as miracles or revealed texts.

3. Miracles

Because Hume’s denial of all miracles in section X of the Enquiry entails a denial of all revealed theology, it is worthwhile to consider his arguments in detail. The section is divided into two parts. While Part I provides an argument against believing in miracles in general, Part II gives four specific considerations against miracles based on particular facts about the world. Therefore, we may refer to the argument of Part I as Hume’s Categorical Argument against miracles and those of Part II as the four Evidential Arguments against miracles. Identifying Hume’s intentions with these arguments is notoriously difficult. Though the Evidential Arguments are fairly straightforward in and of themselves, there are two major interpretive puzzles: what the Categorical Argument of Part I is supposed to be, and how it fits with the Evidential Arguments of Part II. Some see the two parts as entirely separable, while others insist that they provide two parts of a cohesive whole. The following reconstructions attempt to stay interpretively neutral on these disputes.

Hume begins Part I with rules for the appropriate proportioning of belief. First, he divides arguments that justify beliefs regarding cause and effect into proofs and probabilities. Proofs are arguments supported by evidence in which the effects have been constant, such as the sun rising every day. However, there are stronger and weaker proofs—consider a professor showing up for class every day versus the sun rising every day—and only the strongest proofs, those supporting our beliefs in the laws of nature, have been attested to “in all countries and all ages.” Effects, however, are not always constant. When faced with a “contrariety of effects,” we must instead use probabilities, which are evidentially weaker than proofs. Since the strength of both proofs and probabilities varies in degree, we have the potential for “all imaginable degrees of assurance.” Hume maintains that, “The wise man…proportions his beliefs to the evidence.” In cases where effects have been constant and therefore supported by proof, our beliefs are held with a greater degree of assurance than those supported by mere probability (EHU 10.1-4).

Having explained Hume’s model for proportioning beliefs, we can now consider its ramifications for attested miracles:

A miracle is a violation of the laws of nature; and as a firm and unalterable experience has established these laws, the proof against a miracle, from the very nature of the fact, is as entire as any argument from experience can possibly be imagined. (EHU 10.12)

Here, Hume defines a miracle as a “violation of the laws of nature” though he then “accurately” defines a miracle in a footnote as “a transgression of a law of nature by a particular volition of the Deity or by the interposition of some invisible agent.” As to which definition is more relevant, the second more adequately captures the notion of a miracle. In a 1761 letter to Blair, Hume indicates that, as an empirical fact, miracles always have religious content: “I never read of a miracle in my life that was not meant to establish some new point of religion” (L1, Letter 188). A Humean miracle is, therefore, a violation of a law of nature whose cause is an agent outside of nature, though the incompatibility with a law of nature is all that the Categorical Argument requires.

We must, therefore, consider Hume’s conception of the laws of nature. Following Donald Livingston, we may draw out some of the explicit features of Hume’s conception. They are universal, so any falsification of a supposed law or a law’s failure to be upheld would be sufficient to rob it of its nomological status. Laws, therefore, admit of no empirical counterexamples. Secondly, laws of nature are matters of fact, not relations of ideas, as their denial is always coherent. Indeed, like any other matter of fact, they must have some empirical content. As Livingston concludes, “…it must be possible to discipline theoretical talk about unobservable causal powers with empirical observations” (Livingston 1984: 203).

Utilizing this conception of the laws of nature, Hume draws his conclusion:

There must, therefore, be a uniform experience against every miraculous event, otherwise the event would not merit that appellation. And as the uniform experience amounts to a proof, then there is here a direct and full proof, from the nature of the fact, against the existence of any miracle; nor can such a proof be destroyed, or the miracle rendered credible, but by an opposite proof, which is superior….no testimony is sufficient to establish a miracle, unless the testimony be of such a kind, that its falsehood would be more miraculous, than the fact, which it endeavors to establish…. (EHU 10.12-10.13; SBN 115-116, Hume’s emphasis)

The interpretation of this passage requires considerable care. As many commentators have pointed out, if Hume’s argument is: a miracle is a violation of a law of nature, but laws of nature do not admit of counterexamples, therefore there are no miracles, then Hume clearly begs the question. Call this the Caricature Argument. William Paley first attributed this to Hume, and the interpretation has had proponents ever since; but this cannot be Hume’s argument. The Caricature Argument faces three major obstacles, two of which are insurmountable. However, considering the inaccuracies of the Caricature Argument will help us to arrive at a more accurate reconstruction.

First, the Caricature Argument is an a priori, deductive argument from definition. This would make it a demonstration in Hume's vernacular, not a proof. Nonetheless, both the argument of Section X and the letter in which he elucidates it repeatedly appeal to the evidence against miracles as constituting a proof. If the Caricature Argument were correct, then the argument against miracles could not be labeled as such.

A second, related problem is that, if one accepts the Caricature Argument, then one must accept the entailed modality. From the conclusion of the a priori deductive argument, it follows that the occurrence of a miracle would be impossible. If this were the case, then no testimony could persuade a person to believe in the existence of a miracle. However, many take Hume to implicitly reject such an assumption. Such critics point to Hume’s acceptance of the claim that if a sufficient number of people testify to an eight-day darkness, then this constitutes a proof of its occurrence (EHU 10.36). Therefore, there are hypothetical situations in which our belief in a miracle could be established by testimony, implying that the conclusion of the Caricature Argument is too strong. This reply, however, is incorrect. Hume’s description of the proof for total darkness is generally interpreted as his establishing criteria for the rational justification of a belief, based on testimony, that a miracle has occurred. However, we must note that the passage that immediately precedes the example contains an ambiguous disjunct: “…there may possibly be miracles, or violations of the usual course of nature, of such a kind as to admit proof from human testimony” (EHU 10.36 emphasis added). From this passage alone, it is not clear whether Hume means for the darkness scenario to count as an example of the former, the latter, or both. Nevertheless, in Hume’s letter to Blair, he presents a similar example with an unambiguous conclusion. In considering Campbell’s complaint that it is a contradiction for Hume to introduce a fiction in which the testimony of miracle constitutes a proof, he has us consider his previous example concerning the

...supposition of testimony for a particular miracle [that might] amount to a full proof of it. For instance, the absence of the sun during 48 hours; but reasonable men would only conclude from this fact, that the machine of the globe was disordered during this time. (L1, Letter 188)

The conclusion Hume draws is that, even if testimony of a strange event were to amount to a full proof, it would be more reasonable to infer a hiccup in the natural regularity of things (on par with an eclipse, where apparent, but not the disturbance of a higher level regularity), rather than to conclude a miracle. Therefore, when presented with a situation that is either a miracle or a “violation of the usual course of nature,” we ought to infer the latter.

This preference for a naturalistic explanation is reemphasized in Hume’s discussion of Joan of Arc in the History of England. Hume states:

It is the business of history to distinguish between the miraculous and the marvelous; to reject the first in all narrations merely profane and human; to doubt the second; and when obliged by unquestionable testimony…to admit of something extraordinary, to receive as little of it as is consistent with the known facts and circumstances. (H 2.20, Hume’s emphasis )

Here, he once more suggests that we always reject the miraculous testimony and only accept as much of the marvelous as is required to remain consistent with the “unquestionable testimony.” For Hume, testimony of a miracle is always to be rejected in favor of the naturalistic interpretation. He therefore never grants a proof of a miracle as a real possibility, so the Caricature Argument may surmount at least this objection.

However, a final difficulty related to the modality of the conclusion concerns the observation that Hume couches his argument in terms of appropriate belief. Hume’s conclusion should, therefore, be interpreted as epistemic, but the Caricature Argument instead requires a metaphysical conclusion: miracles are impossible. The Caricature Argument cannot be correct, because Hume’s entire argument hinges on the way that we apportion our beliefs, and a fortiori, beliefs about testimony. Hume speaks of “our evidence” for the truth of miracles, belief in them being “contrary to the rules of just reasoning,” and miracles never being “established on…evidence.” “A miracle can never be proved” is a far cry from saying that a miracle has never occurred and never could occur. This gives us reason to reject the metaphysical conclusion of the Caricature Argument.

There are also logical implications against the metaphysical conclusion, such as Hume’s avowal that miracles have an essence, and that there can be un-witnessed miracles. Hume does not say that violations are impossible, only unknowable. Of course, it could be that Hume grants this merely for the sake of argument, but then the stronger conclusion would still have a problem. For whether or not Hume grants the occurrence of miracles, he certainly allows for their conceivability, something the Caricature Argument cannot allow since, for Hume, conceivability implies possibility. Finally, there is the fact that Part II exists at all. If Hume did indeed think that Part I established that miracles could never occur, the entire second part, where he shows that “…there never was a miraculous event established on… [sufficient] evidence” (EHU 10.14), would be logically superfluous. The proper conclusion is, therefore, the epistemic one.

In overcoming the weaknesses of the Caricature Argument, a more plausible Humean argument takes form. Hume’s Categorical Argument of Part I may be reconstructed as follows:

  1. Beliefs about matters of fact are supported only by proofs (stronger) or probabilities (weaker) that come in varying degrees of strength. [Humean Axiom- T, EHU 6.1, EHU 10.6]
  2. When beliefs about matters of fact conflict, assent ought to be given only to the sufficiently supported belief with the greatest degree of evidential support. [Humean Axiom- EHU 10.4, EHU 10.11]
  3. Belief in the occurrence of a miracle would be a matter of fact belief that conflicts with belief in at least one law of nature. [Humean Axiom- EHU 10.2]
  4. Laws of nature are matter of fact beliefs evidentially supported by proofs of the strongest possible type [Empirical Premise- EHU 10.2]
  5. Both testimonial probabilities supporting the occurrence of a miracle and (hypothetical) testimonial proofs supporting the occurrence of a miracle would be evidentially weaker than the proofs supporting the laws of nature. [Empirical Premise- EHU 10.2, EHU 10.13, EHU 10.36. The first clause is true by definition for probabilities, but Hume also establishes it more clearly in Part II.]
  6. Therefore, we should never believe testimony that a miracle has occurred.

There is much to be said for this reconstruction. First, in addition to Humean axioms, we have empirical premises rather than definitions that support the key inferences. Hence, the reconstruction is a proof, not a demonstration. Second, given that Hume has ancillary arguments for these empirical premises, there is no question-begging of the form that the Caricature Argument suggests. For instance, he argues for (4) by drawing on his criterion of “in all countries and all ages.” He does not simply assert that laws of nature automatically meet this criterion.

However, there is a separate worry of question-begging in (4) that needs to be addressed before moving on to the arguments of Part II. The challenge is that, in maintaining Hume’s position that men in all ages testify to the constancy of the laws of nature, any testimony to the contrary (that is, testimony of the miraculous) must be excluded. However, there are people that do testify to miracles. The worry is that, in assigning existence to laws of nature without testimonial exception, Hume may beg the question against those that maintain the occurrence of miracles.

This worry can be overcome, however, if we follow Don Garrett in realizing what Hume is attempting to establish in the argument:

… [when] something has the status of “law of nature”- that is, plays the cognitive role of a “law of nature”- for an individual judger…it has the form of a universal generalization, is regarded by the judger as causal, and is something for which the judger has firm and unalterable experience….This is, of course, compatible with there actually being exceptions to it, so long as one of those exceptions has, for the judger, the status of experiments within his or her experience. (Garrett 1997: 152, Hume’s emphasis)

Garrett rightly points out that in Hume’s argument laws of nature govern our belief, and fulfill a certain doxastic role for the judger. Nonetheless, once this is realized, we can strengthen Garrett’s point by recognizing that this role is, in fact, a necessary condition for testimony of a miracle. To believe in a miracle, the witness must believe that a law of nature has been violated. However, this means that, in endorsing the occurrence of the miracle, the witness implicitly endorses two propositions: that there is an established law of nature in place and that it has been broken. Thus, in order for a witness to convince me of a miracle, we must first agree that there is a law in place. The same testimony which seeks to establish the miracle reaffirms the nomological status of the law as universally believed.

This leads to the second point that Garrett raises. Only after this common ground is established do we consider, as an experiment, whether we should believe that the said law has been violated. Hence, even such a testimonial does not count against the universality of what we, the judges, take to be a law of nature. Instead, we are setting it aside as experimental in determining whether we should offer assent to the purported law or not. If this is right, then (4) does not beg the question. This leaves us with empirical premise (5), which leads to Part II.

Hume begins Part II by stating that, in granting that the testimonies of miracles may progress beyond mere probability, “we have been a great deal too liberal in our concession…” (EHU 10.14). He then gives four considerations as to why this is the case, three of which are relatively straightforward.

First, Hume tells us that, as an empirical fact, “there is not to be found, in all history, any miracle attested by a sufficient number of men, of such unquestioned good sense, education, and learning…” to secure its testimony (EHU 10.15). To be persuaded of a miracle, we would need to be sure that no natural explanation, such as delusion, deception, and so forth, was more likely than the miraculous, a task which, for Hume, would simply take more credible witnesses than have ever attested to a miracle.

Second, it is a fact of human nature that we find surprise and wonder agreeable. We want to believe in the miraculous, and we are much more likely to pass along stories of the miraculous than of the mundane. For Hume, this explains why humans tend to be more credulous with attested miracles than should reasonably be the case, and also explains why the phenomenon is so widespread.

His third, related presumption against miracles is that testimony of their occurrence tends to be inversely proportionate to education: miracles “are observed chiefly to abound among ignorant and barbarous nations” (EHU 10.20). Hume’s explanation for this is that purported miracles are generally born of ignorance. Miracles are used as placeholders when we lack the knowledge of natural causes. However, as learning progresses, we become increasingly able to discover natural causes, and no longer need to postulate miraculous explanations.

Hume’s fourth consideration is also his most difficult:

Every miracle, therefore, pretended to have wrought in any of these religions…as its direct scope is to establish the particular system to which it is attributed; so has it the same force, though more indirectly, to overthrow every other system. In destroying a rival system, it likewise destroys the credit of those miracles, on which that system was established; so that all the [miracles] of different religions are to be regarded as contrary facts, and evidence of these…as opposite to each other. (EHU 10.24)

His general idea is that, since multiple, incompatible religions testify to miracles, they cancel each other out in some way, but scholars disagree as to how this is supposed to happen. Interpreters such as Gaskin (1988: 137-138) and Keith Yandell (1990: 334) focus on Hume’s claim that miracles are generally purported to support or establish a particular religion. Therefore, a miracle wrought by Jesus is opposed and negated by one wrought by Mohammed, and so forth. However, as both Gaskin and Yandell point out, this inference would be flawed, because miracles are rarely such that they entail accepting one religion exclusively. Put another way, the majority of miracles can be interpreted and accepted by most any religion.

However, there is a more charitable interpretation of Hume’s fourth Evidential Argument. As the rest of the section centers around appropriate levels of doxastic assent, we should think that the notion is at play here too. A less problematic reconstruction therefore has his fourth consideration capturing something like the following intuition: the testifiers of miracles have a problem. In the case of their own religion, their level of incredulity is sufficiently low so as to accept their own purported miracles. However, when they turn to those attested by other religions, they raise their level of incredulity so as to deny these miracles of other faiths. Thus, by participating in a sect that rejects at least some miracles, they thereby undermine their own position. In claiming sufficient grounds for rejecting the miracles of the other sects, they have thereby rejected their own. For Hume, the sectarians cannot have their cake and eat it. Intellectual honesty requires a consistent level of credulity. By rejecting their opponent’s claims to miracles, they commit to the higher level of incredulity and should thereby reject their own. Hence, Hume’s later claim that, in listening to a Christian’s testimony of a miracle, “we are to regard their testimony in the same light as if they had mentioned that Mahometan miracle, and had in express terms contradicted it, with the same certainty as they have for the miracle they relate” (EHU 10.24). Thus, the problem for Hume is not that the sectarians cannot interpret all purported miracles as their own but that they, in fact, do not.

These are the four evidential considerations against miracles Hume provides in Part II. However, if the above reconstruction of Part I is correct, and Hume thinks that the Categorical Argument has established that we are never justified in believing the testimony of miracles, we might wonder why Part II exists at all. Its presence can be justified in several ways. First, on the reconstruction above, Part II significantly bolsters premise (5). Second, even if Part II were logically superfluous, Michael Levine rightly points out that the arguments of Part II can still have a buttressing effect for persuading the reader to the conclusion of Part I, thereby softening the blow of its apparently severe conclusion. A third, related reason is a rhetorical consideration. In order for one’s philosophical position to be well-grounded, it is undesirable to hang one’s hat on a single consideration. As Hume himself acknowledges, resting one part of his system on another would unnecessarily weaken it (T Therefore, the more reasons he can present, the better. Fourth, Hume, as a participant in many social circles, is likely to have debated miracles in many ways against many opponents, each with his or her own favored example. Part II, therefore, gives him the opportunity for more direct and specific redress, and he does indeed address many specific miracles there. Finally, the considerations of Part II, the second and third especially, have an important explanatory effect. If Hume is right that no reasonable person would believe in the existence of miracles based on testimony, then it should seem strange that millions have nevertheless done so. Like the Natural History discussed below, Part II can disarm this worry by explaining why, if Hume is right, we have this widespread phenomenon despite its inherent unreasonableness.

4. Immortality of the Soul

In his essay, “Of the Immortality of the Soul,” Hume presents many pithy and brief arguments against considerations of an afterlife. He offers them under three broad headings, metaphysical, moral, and physical. Written for a popular audience, they should be treated as challenges or considerations against, rather than decisive refutations of, the doctrine.

Hume’s metaphysical considerations largely target the rationalist project of establishing a mental substance a priori (such as the discovery of the “I” in DescartesMeditations ). His first two considerations against this doctrine draw on arguments from his Treatise, referring to his conclusion that we have only a confused and insufficient idea of substance. If this is the case, however, then it becomes exceedingly difficult to discover the essence of such a notion a priori. Further, Hume says, we certainly have no conception of cause and effect a priori, and are therefore in no position to make a priori conclusions about the persistence conditions of a mental substance, or to infer that this substance grounds our thoughts. Indeed, even if we admit a mental substance, there are other problems.

Assuming that there is a mental substance, Hume tells us that we must treat it as relevantly analogous to physical substance. The physical substance of a person disperses after death and loses its identity as a person. Why think that the mental substance would behave otherwise? If the body rots, disperses, and ceases to be human, why not say the same thing of the soul? If we reply by saying that mental substances are simple and immortal, then for Hume, this implies that they would also be non-generable, and should not come into being either. If this were true, we should have memories from before our births, which we clearly do not. Note that here we see Hume drawing on his considerations against miracles; implicitly rejecting the possibility of a system whereby God continuously and miraculously brings souls into existence. Finally, if the rationalists are right that thought implies eternal souls, then animals should have them as well since, in the Treatise, Hume argued that mental traits such as rationality obtain by degree throughout the animal world, rather than by total presence or total absence; but this is something that the Christians of Hume’s day explicitly denied. In this way, Hume’s metaphysical considerations turn the standard rationalist assumptions of the theists, specifically the Christian theists of his day, against them.

The moral considerations, however, require no such presuppositions beyond the traditional depictions of heaven and hell. Hume begins by considering two problems involving God’s justice: first, he addresses the defender of an afterlife who posits its existence as a theodicy, maintaining that there is an afterlife so that the good can be appropriately rewarded and the wicked appropriately punished. For reasons considered in detail below, Hume holds that we cannot infer God’s justice from the world, which means we would need independent reasons for positing an alternate existence. However, the success of the arguments discussed above would largely undercut the adequacy of such reasons. Second, Hume points out that this system would not be just regardless. Firstly, Hume claims it is unwarranted to put so much emphasis on this world if it is so fleeting and minor in comparison to an infinite afterlife. If God metes out infinite punishment for finite crimes, then God is omni-vindictive, and it seems equally unjust to give infinite rewards for finitely meritorious acts. According to Hume, most men are somewhere between good and evil, so what sense is there in making the afterlife absolute? Further, Hume raises difficulties concerning birth. If all but Christians of a particular sect are doomed to hell, for instance, then being born in, say, Japan, would be like losing a cosmic lottery, a notion difficult to reconcile with perfect justice. Finally, Hume emphasizes that punishment without purpose, without some chance of reformation, is not a satisfactory system, and should not be endorsed by a perfect being. Hence, Hume holds that considerations of an afterlife seem to detract from, rather than bolster, God’s perfection.

Lastly are the physical (empirical) considerations, which Hume identifies as the most relevant. First, he points out how deeply and entirely connected the mind and body are. If two objects work so closely together in every other aspect of their existence, then the end of one should also be the end of the other. Two objects so closely linked, and that began to exist together, should also cease to exist together. Second, again in opposition to the rationalist metaphysicians, he points out that dreamless sleep establishes that mental activity can be at least temporarily extinguished; we therefore have no reason to think that it cannot be permanently extinguished. His third consideration is that we know of nothing else in the universe that is eternal, or at least that retains its properties and identity eternally, so it would be strange indeed if there were exactly one thing in all the cosmos that did so. Finally, Hume points out that nature does nothing in vain. If death were merely a transition from one state to another, then nature would be incredibly wasteful in making us dread the event, in providing us with mechanisms and instincts that help us to avoid it, and so forth. That is, it would be wasteful for nature to place so much emphasis on survival. Because of these skeptical considerations, Hume posits that the only argument for an immortal soul is from special revelation, a source he rejects along with miracles.

5. The Design Argument

Having discussed Hume’s rejection of revealed theology, we now turn to his critiques of the arguments of Natural Theology, the most hopeful of which, for Hume, is the Design Argument. His assaults on the design argument come in two very different types. In the Dialogues, Hume’s Philo provides many argument-specific objections, while Section XI of the Enquiry questions the fruitfulness of this type of project generally.

In the Dialogues, Cleanthes defends various versions of the design argument (based on order) and the teleological argument (based on goals and ends). Generally, he does not distinguish between the two, and they are similar in logical form: both are arguments by analogy. In analogical arguments, relevant similarities between two or more entities are used as a basis for inferring further similarities. In this case, Cleanthes is draws an analogy between artifacts and nature: artifacts exhibit certain properties and have a designer/creator; parts, or the totality, of nature exhibit similar properties, therefore, we should infer a relevantly analogous designer/creator. Hume’s Philo raises many objections against such reasoning, most of which are still considered as legitimate challenges to be addressed by contemporary philosophers of religion. Replies, however, will not be addressed here. Though Philo presents numerous challenges to this argument, they can be grouped under four broad headings: the scope of the conclusion, problems of weak analogy, problems with drawing the inference, and problems with allowing the inference. The first two types of problem are related in many cases, but not all. After the objections from the Dialogues are discussed, we will turn to Hume’s more general critique from the first Enquiry.

Scope of the Conclusion: Philo points out that, if the analogy is to be drawn between an artifact and some experienced portion of the universe, then the inferred designer must be inferred only from the phenomena. That is, we can only make merited conclusions about the creator based on the experienced part of the universe that we treat as analogous to an artifact, and nothing beyond this. As Philo argues in Part V, since the experienced portion of the world is finite, then we cannot reasonably infer an infinite creator. Similarly, our limited experience would not allow us to make an inference to an eternal creator, since everything we experience in nature is fleeting. An incorporeal creator is even more problematic, because Hume maintains that the experienced world is corporeal. In fact, even a unified, single creator becomes problematic if we are drawing an analogy between the universe and any type of complex artifact. If we follow someone like William Paley, who maintains that the universe is relevantly similar to a watch, then we must further pursue the analogy in considering how many people contributed to that artifact’s coming to be. Crafting a watch requires that many artificers work on various aspects of the artifact in order to arrive at a finished project. Finally, Philo insists that we also lack the ability to infer a perfect creator or a morally estimable creator, though the reasons for this will be discussed below in the context of the Problem of Evil. Given these limitations that we must place on the analogy, we are left with a very vague notion of a designer indeed. As Philo claims, a supporter of the design analogy is only “…able, perhaps, to assert, or conjecture, that the universe, sometime, arose from something like design: But beyond that position, he cannot ascertain one single circumstance, and is left afterward to fix every point on his [revealed] theology…” (D 5.12). This is Gaskin’s “attenuated deism” mentioned above. However, even weakening the conclusion to this level of imprecision still leaves a host of problems.

Problems of Weak Analogy: As mentioned above, many of Philo’s objections can be classified as either a problem with the scope of the conclusion or as a weak analogy. For instance, concluding an infinite creator from a finite creation would significantly weaken the analogy by introducing a relevant disanalogy, but the argument is not vulnerable in this way if the scope of the conclusion is properly restricted. However, beyond these problems of scope, Philo identifies two properties that serve to weaken the analogy but that cannot be discharged via a sufficient limitation of the conclusion. In Part X, Philo points out the apparent purposelessness of the universe. Designed artifacts are designed for a purpose. An artifact does something. It works toward some goal. Thus, there is a property that all artifacts have in common but that we cannot locate in the universe as a whole. For Philo, the universe is strikingly disanalogous to, for instance, a watch, precisely because the former is not observed to work toward some goal. This weakness cannot be discharged by restricting the conclusion, and any attempt to posit a purpose to the universe will either rely on revealed theology or is simply implausible. To show why Philo thinks this, take a few simplified examples: If we say that the universe exists “for the glory of God,” we not only beg the question about the existence of God, but we also saddle our conception of God with anthropomorphized attributes Hume would find unacceptable, such as pride and the need for recognition. Similar problems exist if we say that the universe was created for God’s amusement. However, if we change tactics and claim that the universe was created for the flourishing of humans, or any other species, then for Hume, we end up ignoring the phenomena in important ways, such as the numerous aspects of the universe that detract from human flourishing (such as mosquitoes) rather than contribute to it, and the vast portions of the universe that seem utterly irrelevant to human existence.

Beyond this, Philo finds another intractably weak analogy between artifacts and natural objects. This is the fundamental difference between nature and artifices. Philo holds that the more we learn about nature, the more striking the disanalogy between nature and artifacts. They are simply too fundamentally different. Consider, for instance, that many aspects of nature are self-maintaining and even self-replicating. Even if there are important analogies to be drawn between a deer and a watch, the dissimilarities, for Philo, will always outweigh them.

Problems with Drawing the Inference: There are further problems with the design inference that go beyond the mere dissimilarity of the analogs. Hume’s Philo raises two such objections based on experience. First, there is no clear logical relationship between order and a designer. In Part VII, Philo argues that we do in fact experience order without agency: an acorn growing into an oak tree shows that one does not need knowledge or intent to bestow order. Nor can we reply that the acorn was designed to produce a tree, for this is the very issue in question, and to import design in this way would beg the question. But if we can have order without a designer, then the mere presence of order cannot allow us to infer presence of design.

His second problem with making the design inference is that, like all inductive inferences, the design argument essentially involves a causal component. However, for Hume, knowledge of causal efficacy requires an experienced constant conjunction of phenomena; that is, only after we have seen that events of type B always follow events of type A do we infer a causal relationship from one to the other (see Hume: Causation). However, the creation of the universe necessarily would be a singular event. Since we do not have experience of multiple worlds coming into existence, causal inferences about any cosmogony become unfathomable for Hume in an important sense. This objection is often interpreted as peculiar to Hume’s own philosophical framework, relying heavily on his account of causation, but the point can be made more generally while still raising a challenge for the design argument. Because of our limited knowledge of the origins, if any, of the universe (especially in the 18th century), it becomes metaphysical hubris to think that we can make accurate inferences pertaining to issues such as: its initial conditions, persistence conditions, what it would take to cause a universe, whether the event has or requires a cause, and so forth. This relates to Philo’s next objection.

Problems when the Inference is Allowed: The previous two objections teach us that there are multiple origins of order, and that we are in a poor epistemic state to make inferences about speculative cosmogony. Taking these two points together, it becomes possible to postulate many hypothetical origins of the universe that are, for Hume, on as solid a footing as that of a designer, but instead rely on a different principle of order. Though Philo indicates that there are many, he specifically identifies only four principles which have been experienced to produce order in our part of the universe alone: reason (that is, rational agency), instinct, generation, and vegetation. Though Cleanthes defends reason as the only relevant principle of order, Philo develops alternative cosmogonies based on vegetation, where the universe grows from a seed, and generation, where the universe is like an animal or is like something created instinctively, such as a spider’s web; but Philo should not be taken as endorsing any of these alternative cosmogonies. Instead, his point is that, since we have just as much reason to think that order can arise from vegetation as it can from rational agency, as we have experience of both, there is no obvious reason to think that the inference to the latter, as the source of the order of the universe, is any better than the inference from the former, since we can make just as good an analogy with any of these. If order can come from multiple sources, and we know nothing about the creation of the universe, then Cleanthes is not in a position to give one a privileged position over the others. This means that, if we are to follow Cleanthes in treating the design inference as satisfactory, then we should treat the other inferences as satisfactory as well. However, since we cannot accept multiple conflicting cosmogonies, Philo maintains that we should refrain from attempting any such inferences. As he says in a different context: “A total suspense of judgement is here our only reasonable resource” (D 8.12).

A second problem Philo raises with allowing the design inference is that doing so can lead to a regress. Let us assume that the designer inference is plausible, that is, that a complex, purposive system requires a designing mind as its principle of order. But wait! Surely a creative mind is itself a complex, purposive system as well. A mind is complex, and its various parts work together to achieve specific goals. Thus, if all such purposive systems require a designing mind as their principle of order, then it follows that we would need a designing mind for the designing mind as well. Using the same inference, we would need a designing mind for that mind, and so on. Hence, allowing that complex, purposive systems require a designing mind as their principle of order leads to an infinite regress of designing minds. In order to stop this regress while still maintaining the design inference, one must demand that the designer of the universe does not require a designer, and there are two ways to make this claim. Either one could say that the designing mind that created the universe is a necessary being whose existence does not require a causal explanation, or one could simply say that the designer’s existence is brute. Cleanthes rejects the former option in his refutation of Demea’s “argument a priori” and, more generally, Hume does not think that this form of necessity is coherent. The only option then is to declare that the designer’s existence is brute, and therefore does not require a designer for its explanation. However, if this is the case, and we are allowing brute, undesigned existences into our ontology, then Philo asks why not declare that the universe itself is the brute existence instead? If we are allowing one instance where complexity and purposiveness does not imply a designer, then why posit an extraneous entity based on what is for Philo a dubious inference when parsimony should lead us to prefer a brute universe?

Setting aside the Problem of Evil for later, these are the major specific challenges Hume raises for the design argument in the Dialogues. However, Hume generalizes our inability to use theology to make analogical inferences about the world in Section XI of the Enquiry. Call it the Inference Problem. Rather than raising specific objections against the design argument, the Inference Problem instead questions the fruitfulness of the project of natural theology generally. Roughly stated, the Inference Problem is that we cannot use facts about the world to argue for the existence of some conception of a creator, and then use that conception of the creator to reveal further facts about the world, such as the future providence of this world, and so forth.

First, it is important to realize that the Inference Problem is a special case of an otherwise unproblematic inference. In science, we make this type of inference all the time; for instance, using phenomena to infer laws of nature and then using those laws of nature to make further predictions. Since Hume is clearly a proponent of scientific methodology, we must ask why the creator of the universe is a special and problematic case. The short answer is because of the worry of the Dialogues discussed above, that the creation of the cosmos is necessarily a singular event. This means that the Inference Problem for a creator is a special case for two reasons: first, when inferring the existence and attributes of a creator deity, Hume demands that we use all available data, literally anything available in the cosmos that might be relevant to our depiction of the creator rather than limiting the scope of our inquiry to a specific subset of phenomena. Hence, the deity we posit would represent our best guess based on all available information, unlike the case of discovering specific laws. Second, because the creation was a singular event, Hume insists that we cannot use analogy, resemblance, and so forth, to make good inductive inferences beyond what we have already done in positing the deity to begin with. On account of these two unique factors, there is a special Inference Problem that will arise whenever we try to use our inferred notion of a creator in order to discover new facts about the world.

In order to better understand the Inference Problem, let us take a concrete example, inferring a creator deity who is also just. There are only two possibilities: either the totality of the available evidence of the experienced cosmos does not imply the existence of a just creator or it does. If it does not, then we simply are not merited in positing a just deity and we therefore are not justified in assuming, for instance, that the deity’s justice will be discovered later, say in an afterlife. But if the evidence does imply a just creator deity (that is, the world is sufficiently just such as to allow the inference to a just creator), then Hume says we have no reason to think that a just afterlife is needed in order to supplement and correct an unjust world. In either case, says Hume, we are not justified in inferring further facts about the world based on our conception of the deity beyond what we have already experienced. Mutatis mutandis, this type of reasoning will apply to any conclusion drawn from natural theology. Our conception of the deity should be our best approximation based on the totality of available evidence. This means that for Hume, there are only two possibilities: either any relevant data is already considered and included in inferring our conception of the creator to begin with, and we therefore learn nothing new about the world; or the data is inconclusive and simply insufficient to support the inference to the conception of the deity. Hence, we cannot reasonably make it. If the data is not already there, then it cannot be realized from a permissible inference from the nature of the deity. However, if this is right, then the religious hypothesis of natural theology supplies no new facts about the world and is therefore explanatorily impotent.

6. The Cosmological Argument

Hume couches his concerns about theological inference as emanating from problems with drawing an analogical design inference. Since this is not the only type of argument in natural theology, we must now consider Hume’s reasons for rejecting other arguments that support the existence of a creator deity. Hume never makes a clear distinction between what Immanuel Kant later dubbed ontological and cosmological arguments, instead Hume lumps them together under the heading of arguments a priori. Note that this is not as strange as it might first appear, because although cosmological arguments are now uniformly thought of as a posteriori rather than a priori, this was not the case in Hume’s day. It took Hume’s own insights about the a posteriori nature of causation and of the Principle of Sufficient Reason to make us realize this. For Hume, what is common among such ontological and cosmological arguments is that they infer the existence of a necessary being. Hume seems to slip here, failing to distinguish between the logical necessity of the deity concluded by ontological arguments and the metaphysical necessity of the deity concluded by cosmological arguments. He therefore uniformly rejects all such arguments due to the incoherence of a necessary being, a rejection found in both the Dialogues and the first Enquiry.

In Part IX of the Dialogues, Demea presents his “argument a priori,” a cosmological argument based on considerations of necessity and contingency. The argument was intentionally similar to a version proffered by Samuel Clarke, but is also similar to arguments defended by both Leibniz and Aquinas. Before discussing the rejection of this argument, it is significant to note that it is not Philo that rejects Demea’s “argument a priori” but Cleanthes. Philo simply sits back and lets the assault occur without his help. This is telling because Cleanthes is a theist, though for Hume, ultimately misguided about the success of the design argument. The implication, then, is that for Hume, even the philosophical theist who erroneously believes that natural theology can arrive at an informative conception of a deity should still reject the cosmological argument as indefensible.

Cleanthes’ rejection of the argument a priori is ultimately fourfold. The first problem he suggests is a Category Mistake involved in trying to show that the existence of God is something that can be known a priori. For Hume and for Cleanthes, claims about existence are matters of fact, and matters of fact can never be demonstrated a priori. The important distinction between relations of ideas and matters of fact is that the denial of the former is inconceivable, whereas the denial of the latter is not. Hume maintains that we can always imagine a being not existing without contradiction; hence, all existential claims are matters of fact. Cleanthes finds this argument, “entirely decisive” and is “willing to rest the whole controversy upon it” (D 9.5), and it is a point Philo affirms in Part II. Hume argues similarly in the first Enquiry, maintaining that, “The non-existence of any being, without exception, is as clear and distinct an idea as its existence” (EHU 12.28). Hence, its denial is conceivable, and must be a matter of fact.

A related objection is that, since, for Hume, we can always conceive of a being not existing, there can be nothing essential about its existence. It is therefore not the type of property that can be found in a thing’s essence. Hume’s Cleanthes goes so far as to imply that the appellation “necessary existence” actually has no “consistent” meaning and therefore cannot be used in a philosophically defensible argument.

Thirdly, there is the worry mentioned above of allowing the design inference. Even if the inference is correct and we must posit a causeless being, this does not imply that this being is the deity. The inference is only to a necessary being, and for Philo, it is at least as acceptable to posit the universe as necessary in this way rather than positing an extra entity above and beyond it. This is true whether we posit a necessary being in order to stop a designer regress as above, or if we posit it to explain the contingent beings in the universe.

Finally, Hume thinks there is the dubiousness of the inference itself. A crucial premise of the argument a priori is that an infinite regress is impossible, because it violates the Principle of Sufficient Reason. However, Cleanthes takes contention with this claim. Imagine an infinitely long chain in which each event in that chain is explained through the previous members of the series. Note that in this picture, every member of the series is explained, because for any given member, there is always a prior set of members that fully explains it; but if each member of the series has been explained, then you have explained the series. It is unnecessary and inappropriate to insist on an explanation of the series as a whole. For these reasons, Hume concludes that, “The existence, therefore, of any being can only be proved by arguments from its cause or its effect” (EHU 12.29).

7. The Problem of Evil

In addition to his refutations of the arguments of natural theology, Hume gives positive reasons for rejecting a theistic deity with the Problem of Evil. Hume holds that the evidence of the Problem of Evil counts much more significantly against the theist’s case than the other objections that he raises against a designer, and it is in this area that Philo claims to “triumph” over Cleanthes. Hume’s discussion of the Problem takes place mainly in Parts X and XI of the Dialogues. The discussion is quite thorough, and includes presentations of both the Logical Problem of Evil and the Evidential Problem of Evil. Philo also considers and ultimately rejects several general approaches to solutions.

In Part X, Demea becomes Philo’s unwitting accomplice in generating the Problem of Evil. The two join together to expound an eloquent presentation of moral and natural evil, but with different motives. Demea presents evil as an obstacle that can only be surmounted with the assistance of God. Religion becomes the only escape from this brutish existence. Philo, however, raises the old problem of Epicurus, that the existence of evil is incompatible with a morally perfect and omnipotent deity. Hence, in Part X, Philo defends a version of the logical Problem. Although Philo ultimately believes that, “Nothing can shake the solidity of this reasoning, so short, so clear, so decisive”, he is “contented to retire still from this entrenchment” and, for the sake of argument, is willing to “allow, that pain or misery in man is compatible with infinite power and goodness in the deity” (D 10.34-35, Hume’s emphasis). Philo does not believe that a solution to the logical Problem of Evil is possible but, by granting this concession, he shifts the discussion to the evidential Problem in Part XI.

Hume generally presents the evidential Problem of Evil in two ways: in terms of prior probability and in terms of the likelihood of gratuitous evil. Taking them in order, Demea first hypothesizes a stranger to this world who is dropped into it and shown its miseries. Philo continues along these lines with a similar example in which someone is first shown a house full of imperfections, and is then assured that each flaw prevents a more disastrous structural flaw. For Hume, the lesson of both examples is the same. Just as the stranger to the world would be surprised to find that this world was created by a perfect being, the viewer of the house would be surprised to learn that he was considered a great or perfect architect. Philo asks, “Is the world considered in general…different from what a man…would, beforehand, expect from a very powerful, wise, and benevolent Deity?” (D 11.4, Hume’s emphasis). Since it would be surprising rather than expected, we have reason to think that a perfect creator is unlikely, and that the phenomena do not support such an inference. Moreover, pointing out that each flaw prevents a more disastrous problem does not improve matters, according to Philo.

Apart from these considerations from prior probability, Philo also argues the likelihood of gratuitous evil. To this end, Philo presents four circumstances that account for most of the natural evil in the world. Briefly, these are a) the fact that pain is used as a motivation for action, b) that the world is conducted by general laws, c) that nature is frugal in giving powers, and d) that nature is “inaccurate,” that is, more or less than the optimum level of a given phenomenon, such as rain, can and does occur. As Philo presents these sources of evil during the discussion of the evidential Problem of Evil, his point must be interpreted accordingly. In presenting these sources, all Philo needs to show is that it is likely that at least one of these circumstances could be modified so as to produce less suffering. For instance, in the third circumstance, it seems that, were humans more resistant to hypothermia, this would lead to a slightly better world. In this way, Philo bolsters the likelihood of gratuitous evil by arguing that things could easily have been better than they are.

Having presented the Problem of Evil in these ways, Hume explicitly rejects some approaches to a solution while implicitly rejecting others. First, Demea appeals to Skeptical Theism by positing a deity that is moral in ways that we cannot fathom, but Hume rebuffs this position in several ways. First, Cleanthes denies any appeal to divine mystery, insisting that we must be empiricists rather than speculative theologians. Second, Hume’s Cleanthes insists that, if we make God too wholly other, then we ultimately abandon religion. Hence, in Part XI Cleanthes presents the theist as trapped in a dilemma: either the theist anthropomorphizes the morality of the deity and, in doing so, is forced to confront the Problem of Evil, or he abandons human analogy and, thereby “abandons all religion, and retain[s] no conception of the great object of our adoration” (D 11.1). For Cleanthes, if we cannot fathom the greatness of God, then the deity cannot be an object of praise, nor can we use God to inform some notion of morality. But without these interactions, there is little left for religion to strive toward. We might add a third rejection of the skeptical theist approach: to rationally reject the Problem of Evil without providing a theodicy, we must have independent grounds for positing a good deity. However, Hume has been quite systematic in his attempts to remove these other grounds, rejecting the design and cosmological arguments earlier in the Dialogues, rejecting miracles (and therefore divine revelation) in the Enquiry, and rejecting any pragmatic justification in many works by drawing out the harms of religion. Hence, for Hume, an appeal to divine mystery cannot satisfactorily discharge the Problem of Evil.

Turning to other solutions, Hume does not consider specific theodicies in the Dialogues. Instead, he seems to take the arguments from prior probability and the four circumstances as counting against most or all of them. Going back to the house example, Hume doesn’t seem to think that pointing out that the flaws serve a purpose by preventing more disastrous consequences is sufficient to exonerate the builder. A perfect being should at least be able to reduce the number of flaws or the amount of suffering from its current state. Furthermore, recall that, in focusing on the empirical and in rejecting revealed texts, Hume would not accept any possible retreat to doctrine-specific theodicies such as appeals to the Fall Theodicy or the Satan Theodicy.

Given the amount of evil in the world, Philo ultimately holds that an indifferent deity best explains the universe. There is too much evil for a good deity, too much good for an evil deity, and too much regularity for multiple deities.

8. The Psychology of Religious Belief

Hume wrote the Dialogues roughly in tandem with another work, the Natural History. In its introduction, Hume posits that there are two types of inquiry to be made into religion: its foundations in reason and its origin in human nature. While the Dialogues investigates the former, the explicit task of the Natural History is to explore the latter. In the Natural History, he discharges the question of religion’s foundations in reason by gesturing at the design argument (and the interpretive puzzles discussed above regarding Hume’s views still apply) before focusing on his true task: how various passions give rise to vulgar or false religion.

According to Hume, all religion started as polytheistic. This was due largely to an ignorance of nature and a tendency to assign agency to things. In barbarous times, we did not have the time or ability to contemplate nature as a whole, as uniform. On account of this, we did not understand natural causes generally. In the absence of such understanding, human nature is such that we tend to assign agency to effects, since that is the form of cause and effect that we are most familiar with. This has been well documented in children who will, for instance, talk of a hammer wanting to pound nails. This is especially true of effects that seem to break regularity. Seeing two hundred pounds of meat seemingly moving in opposition to the laws of gravity, is not a miracle, but just a person walking. Primitive humans focused on these breaks in apparent regularity rather than focusing on the regularity itself. While focusing on the latter would lead us to something like a design argument, focusing on the former brings about polytheism. Irregularity can be beneficial, such as a particularly bountiful crop, or detrimental, such as a drought. Thus, on his account, as we exercise our propensity to assign agency to irregularities, a variety of effects gives rise to a variety of anthropomorphized agents. We posit deities that help us and deities that oppose us.

Eventually, Hume says, polytheism gives way to monotheism not through reason, but through fear. In our obsequious praising of these deities, motivated by fear rather than admiration, we dare not assign them limitations, and it is from this fawning praise that we arrive at a single, infinite deity who is perfect in every way, thus transforming us into monotheists. Were this monotheism grounded in reason, its adherence would be stable. Since it is not, there is “flux and reflux,” an oscillation back and forth between anthropomorphized deities with human flaws and a perfect deity. This is because, as we get farther from anthropomorphism, we make our deity insensible to the point of mysticism. Indeed, as Hume’s Cleanthes points out, this is to destroy religion. Therefore, to maintain a relatable deity, we begin to once more anthropomorphize and, when taken too far, we once more arrive at vulgar anthropomorphic polytheism.

Hume insists that monotheism, while more reasonable than polytheism, is still generally practiced in the vulgar sense; that is, as a product of the passions rather than of reason. As he repeatedly insists, the corruption of the best things lead to the worst, and monotheism has two ugly forms which Hume calls “superstition” and “enthusiasm.” Discussed in both the Natural History and the essay, “On Superstition and Enthusiasm”, both of these corrupt forms of monotheism are grounded in inappropriate passions rather than in reason. If we believe that we have invisible enemies, agents who wish us harm, then we try to appease them with rituals, sacrifices, and so forth. This gives rise to priests that serve as intermediaries and petitioners for these invisible agents. This emphasis on fear and ritual is the hallmark of Hume’s “superstition,” of which the Catholicism of his day was his main example. Superstition arises from the combination of fear, melancholy, and ignorance.

Enthusiasm, on the other hand, comes from excessive adoration. In the throes of such obsequious praise, one feels a closeness to the deity, as if one were a divine favorite. The emphasis on perceived divine selection is the hallmark of Hume’s “enthusiasm,” a view Hume saddled to many forms of Protestantism of his day. Enthusiasm thereby arises from the combination of hope, pride, presumption, imagination, and ignorance.

In this way, Hume identifies four different forms of “false” or “vulgar” religion. The first is polytheism, which he sometimes calls “idolatry.” Then there are the vulgar monotheisms, superstition, enthusiasm, and mysticism. Though Hume does not call the last a vulgar religion explicitly, he does insist that it must be faith-based, and therefore does not have a proper grounding in reason. True religion, by contrast, supports the “principles of genuine theism,” and seems to consist mainly in assigning a deity as the source of nature’s regularity. Note that this entails that breaks in reality, such as miracles, count against genuine theism rather than for it. In the Dialogues, Philo has the essence of true religion as maintaining, “that the cause or causes of order in the universe probably bear some remote analogy to human intelligence” (D 12.33). This deity is stripped of the traits that make the design analogy weak, and is further stripped of human passions as, for Philo, it would be absurd to think that the deity has human emotions, especially a need to be praised. Cleanthes, however, supplements his version of true religion by adding that the deity is “perfectly good” (D 12.24). However, because of this added moral component, Cleanthes sees religion as giving morality and order, a position that both Philo and Hume, in the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, deny. Instead, the true religion described by both Hume and Philo is independent of morality. As Yandell (1990: 29) points out, it does not superimpose new duties and motives to the moral framework. True religion does not, therefore, affect morality, and does not lead to “pernicious consequences.” In fact, it does not seem to inform our actions at all. Because true religion cannot guide our actions, Philo holds that the dispute between theists and atheists is “merely verbal.”

9. The Harms of Religion

A historian by profession, Hume spent much effort in his writings examining religion in its less savory aspects. He deplored the Crusades, and saw Great Britain torn asunder on multiple occasions over the disputes between Catholicism and Protestantism. Based on these historical consequences, Hume saw enthusiasm as affecting society like a violent storm, doing massive damage quickly before petering out. Superstition, however, he saw as a more lingering corruption, involving the invasion of governments, and so forth. Hume argued that, because both belief systems are monotheistic, both must be intolerant by their very nature. They must reject all other deities and ways of appeasing those deities, unlike polytheism which, having no fixed dogma, sits lighter on men’s minds. Generally, Hume held that religion, especially popular monotheism, does more harm than good and he thereby develops a critique of religion based on its detrimental consequences.

Yandell (1990: 283) questions the methodology of such an attack. For him, it is not clear what religion’s socio-political consequences tell us about its truth. However, if we view Hume’s attack against religion as systematic, then consequence-based critiques fulfill a crucial role. Setting aside faith-based accounts, there seem to be three ways to justify one’s belief in religion: through revealed theology, through natural theology, or via pragmatic advantage. Hume denies revealed theology, as his argument against miracles, if successful, entails the unsustainability of most divine experiences and of revealed texts. The Dialogues are his magnum opus on natural theology, working to undermine the reasonability of religion and therefore the appeal to natural theology. If these Humean critiques are successful, then the only remaining path for justifying religious belief is from a practical standpoint, that we are somehow better off for having it or for believing it. Cleanthes argues this way in Part XII of the Dialogues, insisting that corrupt religion is better than no religion at all. However, if Hume is right that religion detracts from rather than contributes to morality, and that its consequences are overall negative, then Hume has closed off this avenue as well, leaving us nothing but faith, or perhaps human nature, on which to rest our beliefs.

10. References and Further Reading

Hume wrote all of his philosophical works in English, so there is no concern about the accuracy of an English translation. For the casual reader, any edition of his work should be sufficient. However, Oxford University Press has recently begun to produce the definitive Clarendon Edition of most of his works. For the serious scholar, these are a must have, because they contain copious helpful notes about Hume’s changes in editions, and so forth. The general editor of the series is Tom L. Beauchamp.

a. Hume’s Works on Religion

  • Hume, David. A Treatise of Human Nature. Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K., 2007, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton. (T)
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K., 2000, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp. (EHU)
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. Reprinted in David Hume Enquiries. L.A. Selby-Bigge, Third Edition, Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K. 2002. (EPM)
  • Hume, David. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. In David Hume Dialogues and Natural History of Religion. Oxford University Press, New York, New York, 1993. (D)
  • Hume, David. Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary. Edited by Eugene F Miller. Liberty Fund Inc., Indianapolis, Indiana, 1987. (ES)
  • Hume, David. Natural History of Religion. Reprinted in A Dissertation on the Passions, The Natural History of Religion, The Clarendon Edition of the Works of David Hume, Oxford University Press, 2007. (NHR)
  • Hume, David. New Letters of David Hume. Edited by Raymond Klibansky and Ernest C. Mossner. Oxford University Press, London, England, 1954. (NL)
  • Hume, David. The History of England. Liberty Classics, the Liberty Fund, Indianapolis, Indiana, 1983. (In six volumes) (H1-6)
  • Hume, David. The Letters of David Hume. Edited by J. Y. T. Greig, Oxford University Press, London, England, 1932. (In two volumes) (L1-2)

b. Works in the History of Philosophy

  • Broad, C. D. “Hume’s Theory of the Credibility of Miracles”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, Volume 17 (1916-1917), pages 77-94.
    • This is one of the earliest contemporary analyses of Hume’s essay on miracles. It raises objections that have become standard difficulties, such as the circularity of the Caricature Argument and the seeming incompatibility of Hume’s strong notion of the laws of nature with his previous insights about causation.
  • Butler, Ronald J. “Natural Belief and Enigma in Hume,” Archiv fur Geschichte der Philosophie. 1960, pages 73-100.
    • Butler is the first scholar to argue that religious belief, for Hume, is natural or instinctual. This would mean that, though adherence to a deity is not a product of reason, it may nevertheless be supported as doxastically appropriate. The argument itself has been roundly criticized due to problematic entailments, such as there being no atheists, but the originality of the idea makes the piece merit-worthy.
  • Coleman, Dorothy. “Baconian Probability and Hume’s Theory of Testimony.” Hume Studies, Volume 27, Number 2, November 2001, pages 195-226.
    • Coleman is an extremely careful, accurate, and charitable reader of Hume on miracles. She excels at clearing up misconceptions. In this article, she refocuses Hume’s argument from an anachronistic Pascalian/Bayesian model to a Baconian one, and argues that the “straight rule” of Earman and others is irrelevant to Hume, who insists that probability is only invoked when there has been a contrariety of phenomena.
  • Coleman, Dorothy. “Hume, Miracles, and Lotteries”. Hume Studies. Volume 14, Number 2, November 1988, pages 328-346.
    • Coleman is an extremely careful, accurate, and charitable reader of Hume on miracles. She excels at clearing up misconceptions. In this article, she responds to criticisms of Hambourger and others that Hume’s probability calculus in support of the miracles argument commits him to absurdities.
  • Earman, John. Hume’s Abject Failure—The Argument Against Miracles. Oxford University Press, New York, New York, 2000.
    • In this extremely critical work, Earman argues that the miracles argument fails on multiple levels, especially with regard to the “straight rule of induction.” The work is highly technical, interpreting Hume’s argument using contemporary probability theory.
  • Fogelin, Robert J. A Defense of Hume on Miracles. Princeton University Press, Princeton New Jersey, 2003.
    • In this book, Fogelin takes on two tasks, that of reconstructing Hume’s argument of Part X, and defending it from the recent criticisms of Johnson and Earman. He provides a novel reading in which Part I sets epistemic standards of credulity while Part II shows that miracles fall short of this standard. The subsequent defense relies heavily on this reading, and largely stands or falls based on how persuasive the reader finds Fogelin’s interpretation.
  • Garrett, Don. Cognition and Commitment in Hume’s Philosophy. Oxford University Press. New York, New York, 1997.
    • This is a great introduction to some of the central issues of Hume’s work. Garrett surveys the various positions on each of ten contentious issues in Hume scholarship, including the miracles argument, before giving his own take.
  • Gaskin, J.C.A. Hume’s Philosophy of Religion—Second Edition. Palgrave-MacMillan, 1988.
    • This is perhaps the best work on Hume’s philosophy of religion to date on account of both its scope and careful analysis. This work is one of only a few to provide an in-depth treatment of the majority of Hume’s writings on religion rather than focusing on one work. Though points of disagreement were voiced above, this should not detract from the overall caliber of Gaskin’s analysis, which is overall fair, careful, and charitable. The second edition is recommended because, in addition to many small improvements, there are significant revisions involving Philo’s Reversal.
  • Geisler, Norman L. “Miracles and the Modern Mind”, in In Defense of Miracles- A Comprehensive Case of God’s Action in History, edited by Douglas Geivett and Gary R. Habermas, InterVarsity Press, Downers Grove, Illinois, 1997, pages 73-85.
    • In this article, Geisler raises an important worry that Hume cannot draw a principled distinction between the miraculous and the merely marvelous. Since this is the case, then Hume must reject the marvelous as well, but this would have the disastrous consequence of stagnating science.
  • Hambourger, Robert. “Belief in Miracles and Hume’s Essay.” Nous. N 80; 14: 587-604.
    • In this essay, Hambourger lays out a problem known as the lottery paradox, in which he tries to show that a commitment to Humean probabilistic doxastic assent leads to counterintuitive consequences.
  • Holden, Thomas. Spectres of False Divinity. Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K., 2010.
    • In this careful work, Holden argues that Hume goes beyond mere skepticism to “moral atheism,” the view that the deity cannot have moral attributes. He gives a valid argument supporting this and shows how Hume supports each premise, drawing on a wide variety of texts.
  • Huxley, Thomas Henry. Hume. Edited by John Morley, Dodo Press, U.K., 1879.
    • Huxley is an early commentator on Hume, and this work is the first to raise several worries with Hume’s miracles argument.
  • Johnson, David. Hume, Holism, and Miracles. Cornell University Press, Ithaca, New York, 1999.
    • This is another recent critique of Hume’s account of miracles. Johnson’s work is more accessible than Earman’s, and it is novel in the sense that it addresses several different historical and contemporary reconstructions of Hume’s argument.
  • Kemp Smith, Norman. (ed.) Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc., Indianapolis, Indiana, 1947.
    • In Kemp Smith’s edition of Hume’s Dialogues, he provides extensive interpretation and commentary, including his argument that Hume is represented entirely by Philo and that seeming evidence to the contrary is building stylistic “dramatic balance.”
  • Levine, Michael. Hume and the Problem of Miracles: A Solution. Kluwer Academic Publishers, Dordrecht, Netherlands, 1989.
    • Levine argues that Hume’s miracles argument cannot be read independently of his treatment of causation, and that the two are inconsistent. Nevertheless, a Humean argument can be made against belief in the miraculous.
  • Livingston, Donald W. Hume’s Philosophy of Common Life. University of Chicago Press, Chicago, Illinois, 1984.
    • This is one of the standard explications of Humean causal realism. It stresses Hume’s position that philosophy should conform to and explain common beliefs rather than conflict with them. It is included here because, in the course of his project, Livingston includes a helpful discussion of Humean laws of nature.
  • Paley, William. A View of the Evidences of Christianity, in The Works of William Paley, Edinburgh, 1830.
    • Paley is the first to attribute the Caricature Argument to Hume.
  • Pike, Nelson. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Bobbs-Merrill Company Inc., Indianapolis, IN, 1970.
    • In Pike’s edition of Hume’s Dialogues, he provides extensive interpretation and commentary, as well as a text-based critique of Kemp Smith’s position.
  • Penelhum, Terence. “Natural Belief and Religious Belief in Hume’s Philosophy.” The Philosophical Quarterly, Volume 33, Number 131, 1983.
    • Penelhum previously offered a careful argument that some form of religious belief, for Hume, is natural. However, unlike Butler, he is not committed to the view that religious beliefs are irresistible and necessary for daily life. In this more recent work, he confronts some difficulties with the view and updates his position.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Concept of Miracle. Macmillan, St. Martin’s Press, London, U.K., 1970.
    • Though Swinburne is generally critical of Hume’s position, he is a careful and astute reader. In this general defense of miracles, his reconstruction and critique of Hume is enlightening.
  • Tweyman, Stanley. "Scepticism and Belief in Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion." International Archives of the History of Ideas, Martinus Nyhoff Publishers, 1986.
    • Tweyman presents a holistic reading of the Dialogues, starting with a dogmatic Cleanthes who is slowly exposed to skeptical doubt, a doubt that must ultimately be corrected by the common life. Tweyman ultimately argues that belief in a designer is natural for Hume.
  • Wieand, Jeffery. “Pamphilus in Hume’s Dialogues”, The Journal of Religion, Volume 65, Number 1, January 1985, pages 33-45.
    • Wieand is one of the few recent scholars that argues against Hume as Philo and for a Hume as Cleanthes/Pamphilus view. This interpretation focuses largely on the role of the narrator and Pamphilus’ discussion about the dialogue form.
  • Yandell, Keith E. Hume’s “Inexplicable Mystery”—His Views on Religion. Temple University Press, Philadelphia, Pennsylvania, 1990.
    • Apart from Gaskin, Yandell’s work is the only other major comprehensive survey of Hume on religion. The work is highly technical and highly critical, and is sometimes more critical than accurate. However, he at least provides the general form of some theistic responses to Hume and identifies a few important lapses on Hume’s part, such as a lack of response to religious experience.
  • Yoder, Timothy S. Hume on God. Continuum International Publishing, New York, New York, 2008.
    • Yoder’s text is an extended argument, defending Hume’s “amoral theism”. He makes important contributions in his treatment of false/vulgar religion, the background for English deism, and Hume’s use of irony.


Author Information

C. M. Lorkowski
Kent State University- Trumbull Campus
U. S. A.

Jules Lequyer (Lequier) (1814—1862)

LequyerLike Kierkegaard, Jules Lequyer (Luh-key-eh) resisted, with every philosophical and literary tool at his disposal, the monistic philosophies that attempt to weave human choice into the seamless cloth of the absolute. Although haunted by the suspicion that freedom is an illusion fostered by an ignorance of the causes working within us, he maintained that in whatever ways we are made—by God, the forces of nature, or the conventions of society—there remain frayed strands in the fabric of human existence where self-making adds to the process. Declaring this freedom “the first truth” required by all genuine inquiry into truth, he also challenged traditional doctrines of divine creativity, eternity, and omniscience and he developed his own alternative based on what he saw as the implications of a true metaphysics of freedom.

Lequyer was a reclusive Breton who died in relative obscurity without having published anything. He held no important academic post and most of his literary and philosophical work remained unfinished. Despite these disadvantages, his influence on philosophy was much greater than the ignorance of his thought and of his name would suggest. Charles Renouvier and William James adopted many of his ideas about the meaning of human freedom, its reality, and how it is known. Echoes of Lequyer’s ideas, and sometimes the very phrases he used, are found in French existentialism and American process philosophy. A man of deep religious conviction but also of increasingly melancholy temperament, Lequyer expressed his philosophy in a variety of literary styles. As a consequence, he has been called “the French Kierkegaard,” although he and his more famous Danish contemporary knew nothing of each other.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philosophy of Freedom
  3. Theological Applications
  4. Philosophical Legacy
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. English Translations
    3. Secondary Sources in French and English

1. Biography

Joseph-Louis-Jules Lequyer, born January 29, 1814 in the village of Quintin, France, was an only child. His father, Joseph Lequyer (1779-1837), was a respected physician, and his mother, Céleste-Reine-Marie-Eusèbe Digaultray (1772-1844), cared for the poor and sick in the Quintin hospital. The family name was subject to a variety of spellings, most notably, “Lequier” and “Lequyer” (occasionally with an accent aigu over the first e). Lequyer’s birth certificate had “Lequier” but in 1834 his father had the spelling legally fixed as “Lequyer” [Grenier, La Philosophie de Jules Lequier, 257-58]. Lequyer was not consistent in the way he spelled his name and the orthographic confusion persists in the scholarly literature. “Lequyer” is the spelling on the plaque marking his birthplace in Quintin and on his tombstone in Plérin.

Lequyer’s parents relocated from Quintin to the nearby town of St.-Brieuc along the north coast of Brittany where their son was educated in a little seminary. By the age of thirteen, he excelled in Greek and Latin. A pious Catholic upbringing, combined with his friendship with Louis Épivent (1805-1876), who himself became a cleric, nurtured Lequyer’s interests in philosophy and theology, especially the perennial question of human free will. The family spent vacations just north of St.-Brieuc near Plérin at an isolated cottage known as Plermont (a contraction of “Plérin” and “mont”) within walking distance of the coast. In this rural setting Lequyer spent many happy hours with his closest friend, Mathurin Le Gal La Salle (1814-1904). Another important attachment of his early years was Anne Deszille (1818-1909), also known as “Nanine.” Lequyer never married, although he twice proposed to Deszille (in 1851 and in 1861) and, to his great disappointment, she twice refused.

In 1834 Lequyer entered the École Polytechnique in Paris. The school regimen required students to rise at dawn, eat a meager breakfast, then study scientific subjects—mathematics, physics, and chemistry—until lunchtime. After lunch, there were military exercises, fencing, and horse riding, as well as lessons in dance and music. After supper, students retired to their studies until nightfall. The rigid schedule did not suit Lequyer’s contemplative habits so he was at cross purposes with some of his superiors. His troubles were exacerbated by the unexpected death of his father in 1837. The following year he failed the exam that would have qualified him to become a lieutenant. Viewing an offer to enter the infantry as an insult, he made a dramatic exit. He announced his resignation to the examining officer with these words: “My general, there are two types of justice, mine and yours” [Hémon, 145]. Of some interest is Lequyer’s physical description from his matriculation card: he stood just under five and a half feet, had blond hair, brown eyes, a straight nose, a small mouth, an oval face, a round chin, and scars under his left eye and on the right side of his chin [Brimmer 1975, Appendix III]. The scar on his chin was from a riding accident at the school which, in later years, he covered by wearing a beard.

The course of study in Paris introduced Lequyer to the determinism of Pierre Simon LaPlace (1749-1827). As the school’s military schedule had conflicted with his temperament, so the idea that every event is necessitated by its causes was in tension with his cherished religious ideas, in particular, the conviction of free will. By happy coincidence, he found in his new friend and classmate Charles Renouvier (1815-1903) a sounding board for his quandaries about freedom and necessity. Renouvier saw in Lequyer a strange combination of religious naïveté and philosophical profundity. Indeed, Renouvier never failed to acknowledge Lequyer’s genius and to refer to him—literally, to his dying days—as his “master” on the subject of free will [Derniers entretiens, 64]. Lequyer, chronically unable to complete most of what he wrote, benefited from Renouvier’s industry. Renouvier eventually published a small library of books, in some of which he included excerpts from Lequyer’s writing. Three years after his friend’s death Renouvier published, at his own expense, one-hundred and twenty copies of a handsome edition of his selection of Lequyer’s writings which he distributed free of charge to any interested party.

Upon leaving the École Polytechnique, Lequyer used the inheritance from his father to retire to Plermont where he lived with his mother and the family servant, Marianne Feuillet (probably born in 1792). Lequyer never had a head for finances, so his money was soon exhausted, although there remained properties in St.-Brieuc that his father had owned. In 1843, the three moved to Paris where Lequyer acquired a position teaching French composition to Egyptian nationals at the École Égyptienne. He had the misfortune of teaching at the school during its decline. Nevertheless, he worked to redesign its curriculum after the model of the École Polytechnique, but centered more on literature, poetry, and even opera. Lequyer’s mother died the year following the move to Paris. Worried over the state of her son’s mind, she entrusted him to the care of Feuillet with these words: “Oh, Marianne, keep watch over my poor Jules. He has in his heart a passion which, I greatly fear, will be the cause of his death” [Hémon, 172]. The exact object of his mother’s concern is unknown but in the fullness of time her words became prophetic.

On August 15, 1846, the day of celebration of the Assumption of Mary, Lequyer underwent a mystical experience that was occasioned by his meditations on the Passion of Christ. He wrote down his experience, alternating between French and Latin, which invites a comparison with Pascal’s Memorial. Lequyer’s indignation at those who caused Christ’s suffering is transformed, first, into a profound sense of repentance as he realizes that he too had “added some burden to the cross” by his sins, and, second, into the gratitude for the love of God in being forgiven his sins. On August 19th, the religious ecstasy recurred, this time as he took communion at the church of St.-Sulpice. Again, the theme of the suffering of Christ is paramount, but now giving way to a determination to share in those sufferings to such an extent that the Virgin Mary would be unable to distinguish him from her own son. Lequyer’s first biographer, Proper Hémon (1846-1918), spoke of the philosopher’s “bizarre religiosity” [Hémon, 184], but there can be no question that, despite his shortcomings and misfortunes, his mystical experiences found outlet in acts of devotion and charity for the remainder of his life.

Lequyer returned to Plermont with Feuillet in 1848, after the February revolution in Paris. Full of zeal for a rejuvenated Republic, he announced, with Renouvier’s help, his candidacy for a seat in the parliament of the Côtes-du-Nord as a “Catholic Republican” [Hémon, 188]. His published platform identifies freedom as the basis of rights and duties and it explicitly mentions the freedoms of the press, of association, of education, and of religion [Le Brech, 56-57]. Of note is that Lequyer received a glowing recommendation for political office from one of his former teachers at the École Polytechnique, Barthélémy Saint-Hilaire. However, like many in more rural areas who identified, or seemed to identify, with the Parisian revolutionaries, Lequyer was not elected. He came in twentieth on the list of candidates, receiving far too few votes to be among those who won a seat in the parliament.

After the election, which was in April 1848, Lequyer retired to Plermont and spent his days in study and meditation, which included long walks along the coast; sometimes he would stay out overnight. There was, however, the persistent problem of finances. Hémon reports that Lequyer would throw change wrapped in paper from his second floor study to the occasional beggar that passed by. From March 30, 1850 into 1851, he sold the family property in St.-Brieuc, leaving him only Plermont. When his aunt Digaultray died on March 31, 1850 he was hopeful of an inheritance of 10,000 francs. As luck would have it, the aunt’s will directed that the sum be doubled, but only on the condition that it be used to pay a debt of 20,000 francs that Lequyer owed to his first cousin, Palasme de Champeaux! The cousin died in August of the same year, so the inheritance went to his estate [Hémon, 245].

Lequyer’s letters to Renouvier indicate a heightened level of creativity in which he made major progress on his philosophical work. In a November 1850 letter, he claimed that he was writing “something unheard of,” namely that the first and most certain of truths is the declaration of one’s own freedom. This movement of thought ends with the idea that one is one’s own work, responsible to oneself, and “to God, who created me creator of myself” (Lequyer had written “creature of myself” but later changed it to “creator of myself”) [OC 70, 538]. Philosophical insights, however, were not enough to save Lequyer from the weight of his failed projects and his destitution which, arguably, contributed to a mental breakdown. On February 28, 1851, a neighbor found Lequyer wandering about with an axe with which he intended to cut his own arm; Lequyer was taken to the hospital in St.-Brieuc for observation. The doctors determined that he was a danger to himself and should be transferred to a mental institution. On March 3rd, Le Gal La Salle and the Abbot Cocheril took Lequyer to the asylum near Dinan, using subterfuge to lure him there. On April 12th, with the help of Paul Michelot (1817-1885) and some other friends, Lequyer was taken to Passy, near Paris, to the celebrated hospital-resort of Dr. Esprit Blanche, the well-known physician who specialized in mental disorders.

Lequyer was discharged from Passy on April 29th, improved but not completely recovered, according to the doctors. He returned to Plermont, there to be welcomed by the faithful Feuillet and to renew contact with an elderly neighbor, Madame Agathe Lando de Kervélégan (born 1790). Relations with others, however, were broken or became strained. Never accepting that his confinement was justified, he severed ties with Le Gal La Salle who he regarded as the one who had orchestrated it. In the book that he planned, a major section was labeled “Episode: Dinan.” Since the book was never completed, we cannot know Lequyer’s exact thoughts about his two months under medical supervision. That his perceptions were cloudy is indicated by the fact that, only a few months after his confinement, he proposed marriage to Nanine, believing she would accept. Her family, with a view to Lequyer’s mental and financial instability, encouraged her to refuse. This she did in a most forceful way by returning all of his letters and by instructing him to burn her letters to him. This he did, but not before making copies of certain excerpts.

For two years after the events of 1851 Lequyer’s whereabouts are unknown. His letters to Renouvier in the closing months of 1855 indicate that two years earlier he had gone to Besançon as a professor of mathematics at the Collège Saint-François Xavier. By Easter of 1854, however, relations with the head of the college, a Monsieur Besson, had gone sour. The details of the problem are unknown, but it seems that Besson scolded Lequyer for not coming to him to ask for something. According to Lequyer, Besson boasted that men of influence as great as the arch-bishop, “crawl at my feet” [OC 546]. Lequyer related this conversation to the Cardinal and Besson was demoted. One of Lequyer’s friends, Henri Deville, had written a well-intentioned letter to the Cardinal requesting that he find Lequyer another place in his diocese. The Cardinal, perhaps misinterpreting the request, turned against Lequyer. As a result, Lequyer was entangled in law suits with both Besson and the Cardinal over indemnities. Lequyer’s lawyer told him “all was lost” when he decided to act with dignity and not crawl at Besson’s feet [OC 549]. An interesting aspect of Lequyer’s sketchy account is that he says he was inspired by the memory of Dinan, imitating the man he had been there by controlling his anger in spite of the wrongs he perceived to have been done to him. Furthermore, he recognized Deville’s good intentions and, though he thought his intervention inappropriate, did not blame him for it.

By the close of 1855 Lequyer had returned to Plermont, never to leave again. Many of the most touching stories about Lequyer come from the last six years of his life. Though his relations with his friends were often strained, he inspired in them a seemingly unconditional loyalty. It was they after all who underwrote the considerable cost of staying at Passy. In his final years, his friends—including Le Gal La Salle who he had disowned—came to his aid more than once. For example, Lequyer frequented a restaurant in St.-Brieuc but would order embarrassingly meager portions. When the owner of the establishment told his friends, they instructed him to give Lequyer full meals and they would pay the difference. When the owner wondered whether Lequyer would notice the charity, the reply was, “Non, il est dans le ciel” [Hémon, 205]—his head is in the clouds—an apt metaphor for his impracticality and his philosophical preoccupations.

In 1858, on the recommendation of Madame Lando, Lequyer became the tutor of Jean-Louis Ollivier, the thirteen year old son of a customs officer of the same name who admired Lequyer’s rhetorical skills; the father once described Lequyer as “a magician of words” [Hémon, 191]. Lequyer taught young Ollivier but also employed him in transcribing Lequyer’s own writing into a more legible script. Ollivier studied with Lequyer for two years but at the close of 1860, passing the exam that allowed him the chance to study to become an administrator of the state, the boy left. A few months earlier (in April) Lequyer had the misfortune of losing a chance to become chief archivist for the Côtes-du-Nord because of a delay in mail service. With this opportunity missed and Ollivier gone, Lequyer was without his student and unemployed. Jean-Louis Le Hesnan, a man of twenty who was too frail to work in the fields took Olliver’s place as Lequyer’s secretary. This partnership, however, was not enough to lift the weight of loneliness.

In the year that followed, Lequyer’s condition deteriorated. His neighbors reported that he would lose track of time and come calling at late hours with no explanation. His hair and beard, no longer cared for, grew prematurely white. His gaze took on a lost and vacant stare. Lequyer’s quixotic hopes of marriage to Nanine were rekindled when, on December 28, 1861, her father died—he believed her father was the main obstacle to the marriage. He again proposed marriage; sometime in the first week of February he learned of her refusal, which she made clear was final. Lequyer’s behavior became frenzied and erratic. He was subject to bizarre hallucinations and he spoke of putting an end to his misery. On Tuesday, February 11, 1862, Lequyer went to the beach with Le Hesnan, shed his clothes, threw water on his chest, and jumped into the bay. He swam to the limits of his strength until he was visible only as a dot among the waves and he cried out. According to Le Hesnan, Lequyer’s last words would not have been a cry of distress but a farewell to Deszille—“Adieu Nanine” [Hémon, 232] At nine o’clock in the evening, Lequyer’s body washed ashore. Feuillet, who Lando described as Lequyer’s “second mother,” was waiting at Plermont to receive the body.

The official police report mentioned Lequyer’s “disturbed spirit” but ruled his death accidental. Nevertheless, a controversy erupted when a newspaper published a poem, “Les Adeiux de Jules Lequyer,” [The Farewells of Jules Lequyer] which was written in Lequyer’s voice and which suggested that he had committed suicide [Grenier, La Philosophie, 272]. Madame Lando eventually revealed herself as the author of the poem; she explained that she was saying Lequyer’s farewells for him in a way that he would have wished. The most propitious result of the controversy is that Charles Le Maoût, writing for Le Publicateur des Côtes-du-Nord (March 1, 1862), published an article titled “Derniers Moments de Jules Lequyer” [Last Moments of Jules Lequyer]. The article includes reports of Lequyer’s friends and neighbors about his final days, thereby providing insight into the disoriented and melancholy condition into which the philosopher had fallen. In November 1949, Dr. Yves Longuet, a psychiatrist at Nantes gave his professional opinion from the available evidence. He concluded that Lequyer suffered a “clear cyclopthemia,” that is to say, a manic-depressive personality [Grenier 1951, 37].

2. Philosophy of Freedom

Renouvier’s edition of Lequyer’s work, noted above, bore the title La Recherche d’une première vérité [The Search for a First Truth]. The book is divided into three sections. The first, titled Comment trouver, comment chercher une première vérité? [How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?], is prefaced by a brief quasi-autobiographical meditation, “La Feuille charmille” [The Hornbeam Leaf]. The second and third sections are, respectively, Probus ou le principe de la science: Dialogue [Probus or the Principle of Knowledge: Dialogue] and Abel et Abel—Esaü et Jacob: Récit biblique [Abel and Abel—Esau and Jacob: Biblical Narrative]. Collections edited by Jean Grenier in 1936 and 1952 brought together most of Lequyer’s extant work, including excerpts from his correspondence. Curiously absent from Grenier’s editions is a meditation on love and the Trinity; longer and shorter versions of this were published in subsequent collections (Abel et Abel 1991, pp. 101-08; La Recherche 1993, pp. 319-22). An unfinished short story from Lequyer’s earlier years titled La Fourche et la quenouille [The Fork and the Distaff] was published in 2010 and edited by Goulven Le Brech. Other collections have been published, but these form the corpus of Lequyer’s work.

“The Hornbeam Leaf” is Lequyer’s best known work. It was the one thing he wrote that he considered complete enough to distribute to his friends. It addresses, in the form of a childhood experience, the meaning and reality of freedom. Lequyer intended it to be the introduction to his work. It exhibits the best qualities of Lequyer’s writing in its dramatic setting, its poetic language, and its philosophical originality. Lequyer recalls one of his earliest memories as he played in his father’s garden. He is about to pluck a leaf from a hornbeam when he considers that he is the master of his action. Insignificant as it seems, the decision whether or not to pluck the leaf is in his power. He marvels at the idea that his act will initiate a chain of events that will make the world forever thereafter different than it might have been. As he reaches for the leaf, a bird in the foliage is startled. It takes flight only to be seized by a sparrow hawk. Recovering from the shock of this unintended consequence of his act, the child reflects on whether any other outcome was really possible. Perhaps the decision to reach for the leaf was one in a series of events in which each cause was itself the inevitable effect of a prior cause. Perhaps the belief that he could have chosen otherwise, that the course of events might have been different, is an illusion fostered by an ignorance of the antecedent factors bearing on the decision. The child is mesmerized by the thought that he might be unknowingly tangled in a web of necessity, but he recovers the faith in his freedom by a triumphant affirmation of his freedom.

Renouvier remarked that “The Hornbeam Leaf” recorded the point of departure of Lequyer’s philosophical effort [OC 3]. More than this, it illustrates the salient characteristics of freedom as Lequyer conceived them. For Lequyer, at a minimum, freedom involves the twin ideas that an agent’s decision is not a mere conduit through which the causal forces of nature operate and that it is itself the initiator of a chain of causes. Prior to the decision, the future opens onto alternate possibilities. The agent’s decision closes some of these possibilities while it opens others. After the decision is made, the feeling persists that one could have decided differently, and that the past would have been different because of the decision one might have made. Because the course of events is at least partially determined by the agent’s decision, Lequyer maintains that it creates something that, prior to the decision, existed only as a possibility. If one is free in this sense, then one is part creator of the world, and also of others. The child’s gesture leads to the bird’s death. Lequyer draws the corollary that the smallest of beginnings can have the greatest of effects that are unforeseen by the one who initiated the causal chain, a thought that makes even the least of decisions potentially momentous [OC 14, compare OC 201]. This is Lequyer’s version of what Edward Lorenz much later, and in a different context, dubbed “the butterfly effect”—a butterfly flaps its wings in Brazil which leads to a tornado in Texas.

For Lequyer, one’s decisions not only create something in the world, they double back on oneself. If one is free then, in some respects, one is self-creative. These ideas are expressed cryptically in Lequyer’s maxim which occurs in the closing pages of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?: “TO MAKE, not to become, but to make, and, in making, TO MAKE ONESELF” [OC 71]. When Lequyer denies that making is a form of becoming he is saying that the free act is not a law-like consequence of prior conditions. This is not to say that making or self-making is wholly independent of prior conditions. Lequyer borrows the language of Johann Fichte and speaks of the human person as a “dependent independence” [OC 70; compare OC 441]. Lequyer is clear that one is not responsible for having come to exist nor for all the factors of nature and nurture that brought one to the point of being capable of thinking for oneself and making one’s own decisions. All of these are aspects of one’s dependence and Lequyer often underscores their importance. On the other hand, one’s independence, as fragile and seemingly insignificant as it may be, is the measure of one’s freedom. This freedom, moreover, is the essential factor in one’s self-making. For Lequyer, it makes sense not only to speak of one’s decisions as being expressions of one’s character as so far formed, but also to speak of one’s character as an expression of one’s decisions as so far made.

Lequyer considers the objection that his view of freedom involves “a sort of madness of the will” [OC 54; compare OC 381]; by claiming that the free act, like a role of dice, could go one way or another, Lequyer seems to imply that freedom is only randomness, a “liberty of indifference” undisciplined by reason. Lequyer replies that arbitrariness is indeed not the idea of freedom, but he claims that it is its foundation. In Lequyer’s view, one is oneself the author of the chance event and that event is one’s very decision. His meaning seems to be that indeterminism—the idea that, in some instances, a single set of causal factors is compatible with more than one possible effect—is a necessary but not a sufficient condition of acts for which we hold a person accountable. In the process of deliberation, motives are noticed and reasons are weighed until one decides for one course of action over another. The will is manifested in the sphere of one’s thought when one causes one idea to prevail over others and one’s hesitation is brought to an end. The act resulting in a decision may be characterized in any number of ways—capricious, selfish, reasonable, moral—but it is in no sense a product of mere brute force. The entire process of deliberation, Lequyer says, is animated by the self-determination of the will. Should an explanation be demanded, appealing to antecedent conditions for exactly why the decision was made one way rather than another, Lequyer replies that the demand is question-begging, for it presupposes determinism [OC 47]. The free act is not a mere link in a causal chain; it is at the origin of such chains. In Lequyer’s words, “To act is to begin” [OC 43].

It is clear that Lequyer did not believe that freedom and determinism can both be true. He acknowledged that we often act, without coercion, in accordance with our desires. Lequyer says that “the inner feeling”—presumably, introspectively discerned—guarantees it [OC 50]. Some philosophers look no further than this for a definition of freedom. For Lequyer, however, this is not enough, for non-human animals often act without constraint [OC 334, 484]. To speak of free will one must also include the idea that one is the ultimate author of one’s decisions. He counsels not to confuse the lack of a feeling of dependence upon causal conditions that would necessitate one’s decision with the feeling of independence of such conditions. The confusion of these ideas, Lequyer claims, leads us to believe that we have more freedom than we actually have. All that we are allowed to say, based on introspection, is that we sometimes do not feel necessitated by past events. An analogous argument for determinism is likewise inconclusive. When we come to believe through a careful examination of a past decision that causes were at work of which we were unaware and which strongly suggest that the decision was inevitable, we are not warranted in generalizing to all of our decisions, supposing that none of them are free [OC 50].

In the dramatic finale of “The Hornbeam Leaf” the child affirms his own freedom. This affirmation is not based on an argument in the sense of inferring a conclusion from premises that are more evident than freedom itself. Lequyer reaches a theoretical impasse—an aporia—on the question of freedom and necessity. Somewhat anticipating Freud, he never tires of emphasizing the depth of our ignorance about the ultimate causes of our decisions. Indeed, the final sentence of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? cautions that we never know whether a given act is free [OC 75]. Moreover, he denies that we experience freedom [OC 52; compare OC 349, 353]. He argues that this would involve the impossibility of living through the same choice twice over and experiencing the decision being made first in one way and then being made in the contrary way. The memory of the first choice—or at least the mere fact of its having taken place—would intrude on the second and thus it would not be the same choice in identical circumstances. Lequyer speaks, rather, of a “presentiment” of freedom, the stubbornly persistent sense that we have that, in a given circumstance, we could have chosen differently [OC 52]. Yet, Lequyer maintains, such is the extent of our ignorance—our lack of self-knowledge—that it is often easier to believe that one is free when one is not than to believe that one is free when one really is [OC 53].

Notwithstanding Lequyer’s many caveats about the limitations on freedom and even of knowing whether free will exists, he is above all a champion of human liberty. What remains to be explained is the ground of this affirmation. Despite the fragmentary nature of his literary remains, the general outline of his thinking is clear. How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? begins as a Cartesian search for an indubitable first truth but it diverges from Descartes’ project in being more than a theoretical exercise. Lequyer speaks of the “formidable difficulty” that stands in the way of inquiry: if one seeks truth without prejudice one runs the risk of changing one’s most cherished convictions [OC 32]. He uses a Pascalian image to illustrate the attempt to seek truth without risk of losing one’s convictions. He says that it would be like walking along a road imagining a precipice on either side; something would be missing from the experience, “the precipice and the vertigo.” Lequyer continues in Pascal’s vein by raising the possibility that honest investigation may not support one’s faith. The heart can place itself above reason but what one most desires is that faith and reason be in harmony [OC 33]. There is, finally, the difficulty that sincere doubt is “both impossible and necessary from different points of view” [OC 30]. It is impossible because doubting what is evident (for example, that there is a world independent of one’s mind) is merely feigned doubt; it is necessary because one cannot assume that what is evident is true (for example, even necessary truths may seem false and people have genuine disagreements about what they firmly believe), otherwise, the search for truth would never begin.

Lequyer’s differences with Descartes are also apparent in his treatment of the skeptical argument from dreaming: because dreams can feel as real as waking life, one cannot be certain that one is awake. Lequyer notes that the search for a first truth requires a sustained effort of concentration in which one actively directs one’s thoughts. In dreams, impressions come pell-mell and one is more a spectator of fantastic worlds than an actor sustaining one’s own thoughts. Lequyer concedes that he cannot be certain that he is awake, but he can be certain that he does not inhabit any ordinary dream. If one sleeps it is one’s thoughts that one doubts; if one is awake, it is one’s memory that one doubts [OC 36]. Lequyer avers that the former is a less feigned doubt than the latter. Pushed further by the radical skepticism to justify one’s belief in the external world, Lequyer prefers the answer of the child: “Just because” [OC 37]. His discussion takes a decidedly existential detour as he reflects on the solitude implicit in the impossibility of directly knowing the thoughts of another. Lequyer’s is not the academic worry of Descartes of how we know that another person is not a mere automaton, it is rather the sense of isolation in contemplating the gulf between two minds even when there is the sincere desire on both of their parts to communicate [OC 37].

It is Lequyer’s treatment of the cogito (“I think”) that takes one to the heart of his philosophy of freedom. He acknowledges the certainty of Descartes’ “I think therefore I am” but he criticizes his predecessor for leaving the insight obscure and therefore of not making proper use of it [OC 329]. The obscurity, Lequyer says, is in the concept of a self-identical thinking substance—sum res cogitans. The cogito is precisely the activity of a thinking subject having itself as an object of thought. In the language of the phenomenologists, Lequyer is puzzled by the intentionality within self-consciousness—the mind representing itself to itself [compare OC 362]. He argues that there is an essentially temporal structure to this relation; the “self” of which one is aware in self-awareness is a previous state of oneself. Lequyer goes so far as to call consciousness “nascent memory” [OC 339-40]. This is a significant departure from Descartes who does not even include memory in his list of characteristics of thought. Descartes says that by “thought” he means understanding, willing, sensing, feeling, and imagining (abstaining by methodical doubt, to be sure, from any judgment about the reality of the object of one’s thought). The omission of “remembering” is curious; “I (seem to) remember, therefore I am” is an instance of the cogito and memory is not obviously reducible to any of the other characteristics of thought. Although Lequyer does not claim that self-memory is perfect, he maintains that each aspect of self-consciousness—as subject and as object—requires the other. Their unity, he maintains, is nothing other than the activity of unifying subject and object. Furthermore, the on-going sequence of events that is consciousness requires that each emergent “me” becomes an object remembered by a subsequent “me.” The “Hornbeam Leaf” is itself the report of such an act of remembering.

For Lequyer, the analysis of the “I think” reveals a more fundamental fact, to wit, “I make.” The making, moreover, is a self-making, for one is continually unifying the dual and interdependent aspects of oneself as subject and as object [OC 329]. Because this process of self-formation is not deterministic, it is open-ended. Lequyer characterizes the relation of cause and effect in a free act as asymmetrical. He labels the relation from effect (subject) to cause (object) as “the necessary” because the subject would not be what it is apart from the object that it incorporates into self-awareness; however, he labels the relation from cause (object) to effect (subject) as “the possible” in the sense that the object remains what it is independent of the subject incorporating it. Lequyer says that “the effect is the movement by which the cause determines itself” [OC 473]. Lequyer’s asymmetrical view of causation, at least where the free act is concerned, diverges from that of the determinist. In deterministic thinking, necessity flows symmetrically from cause to effect and from effect to cause; “the possible,” for determinism, is only a product of our ignorance of the causal matrix that produces an effect. Lequyer agrees that ignorance is a factor in our talk of possibility. He notes that the hand that opens a letter that contains happy or fatal news still trembles, hoping for the best and fearing the worst, each “possibility” considered, although one knows that one of the imagined outcomes is now impossible [OC 60]. Lequyer’s indeterminism, on the other hand, allows that possibilities outrun necessities, that the future is sometimes open whether or not we are ignorant of causes.

Lequyer writes that “it is an act of freedom which affirms freedom” [OC 67]. As already noted, for Lequyer, free will is not deduced from premises whose truth is more certain than the conclusion. We have also seen that he denies that free will can be known directly in experience [OC 353]. The logical possibility remains—entertained by the child in “The Hornbeam Leaf” and spelled out in greater detail in the fourth part of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?—that free will is an illusion, that one’s every thought and act is necessitated by the already completed course of events reaching into the past before one’s birth. Lequyer addresses the impasse between free will and determinism with the following reasoning (Renouvier called this Lequyer’s double dilemma). Either free will or determinism is true, but which one is true is not evident. Lequyer says that one must choose one or the other by means of one or the other. This yields a four-fold array: (1) one chooses freedom freely; (2) one chooses freedom necessarily; (3) one chooses necessity freely; (4) one chooses necessity necessarily [OC 398; compare Renouvier’s summary, OC 64-65]. One’s affirmation should at least be consistent with the truth, which means that the array reduces to the first and last options. Of course, the determinist believes that the second option characterizes the advocate of free will; by parity of reasoning, the free willist believes that the third option characterizes the determinist. Again, there is stalemate.

Inspired by the example of mathematics, Lequyer proposes to break the deadlock by considering “a maximum and a minimum at the same time, the least expense of belief for the greatest result” [OC 64, 368]. He compares the hypotheses of free will and determinism as postulates for how they might make sense of or fail to make sense of human decisions. Lequyer, it should be noted, conceives the non-human world of nature as deterministic, so his discussion of free will is limited to the human realm and, in his theology, to that of the divine [OC 475]. It is in considering the two postulates, according to Lequyer, that the specter of determinism casts its darkest shadow. First, with Kant, Lequyer accepts that free will is a necessary postulate to make sense of the moral life [OC 345; compare OC 484-85]. If no one could have chosen otherwise than they chose, there is no basis for claiming that they should have chosen otherwise; judgments of praise and blame, especially of past actions, are groundless if determinism is true. Second, Lequyer goes beyond Kant by claiming that free will is necessary for making sense of the search for truth [OC 398-400]. Lequyer’s reasoning is not as clear as one would like, but the argument seems to be as follows. The search for truth presupposes that the mind can evaluate the reasons for and against a given proposition. The mechanisms of determinism are not, however, sensitive to reasons; indeed, no remotely plausible deterministic laws have been found or proposed for understanding intellectual inquiry. Renouvier elaborated this point by saying that, as the freedom of indifference involves (as Lequyer says) an active indifference to reasons, so determinism involves a passive indifference to reasons. Thus, determinism, by positing necessity as the explanation for our reasoned judgments, undermines the mind’s sensitivity to reasons and therefore allows no way clear of skepticism.

Lequyer’s reasoning, even if it is sound, does not decide the issue in favor of free will. Nor does Lequyer claim that it does. Determinism may yet be true and, if Lequyer is correct, the consequences are that morality is founded on a fiction and we can have no more trust in our judgments of truth and falsity than we can have in a random assignment of truth values to propositions. In the final analysis, the truth that Lequyer seeks is less a truth that is discovered than it is a truth that is made. The free act affirms itself, but because the act is self-creative, it is also a case of the act creating a new truth, namely, that such and such individual affirmed freedom. If freedom is true, and if Lequyer’s reasoning is correct, then the one who creates this fact has the virtue of being able to live a life consistent with moral ideals and of having some hope of discovering truth.

3. Theological Applications

Renouvier deemphasized the theological dimensions of Lequyer’s thought. He said he was bored by Lequyer’s views on the Trinity. He suggested demythologizing Lequyer’s religious ideas so as to salvage philosophical kernels from the theological husk in which they were encased. Obviously, Lequyer did not agree with this approach. Indeed, he devoted approximately twice as much space in his work to topics in philosophy of religion and Christian theology as he did to strictly non-religious philosophizing. Grenier convincingly argued that Lequyer’s design was a renewal of Christian philosophy [OC 326]. One may, however, sympathize with Renouvier’s concerns, for a few of Lequyer’s ruminations are now dated. He seemed to have no knowledge of the sciences that, in his own day, were revealing the astounding age of the earth and the universe. Adam and Eve were real characters in his mind and he speculated on Christ’s return in a few years because of the symmetry between the supposed two-thousand year interval from the moment of creation until the time of Christ and the fact that nearly two-thousand more years had elapsed since Jesus walked the earth [OC 439-40]. Despite these limitations Lequyer’s treatment of religious themes is not, for the most part, dependent on outdated science. His views prefigure developments in philosophical theology in the century and a half since his death, giving his thought a surprisingly contemporary flavor.

Lequyer’s more explicitly theological works are as notable for their literary qualities as for their philosophical arguments. Probus or the Principle of Knowledge, also known as the Dialogue of the Predestinate and the Reprobate, is a nearly complete work in three parts. The first section is a dialogue between two clerics who have been made privy to the future by means of a tableau that pictures for them the contents of divine foreknowledge. Neither character is named, but one is sincerely faithful while the other exhibits only a superficial piety. They see in the tableau that the hypocritical cleric will repent and enter heaven but the pious cleric will backslide and live with the demons. When “the reprobate” begins to despair, “the predestinate” tries to offer him hope of going to heaven. Hope comes in the form of arguments from medieval theologians that are designed to show the compatibility of God’s foreknowledge and human freedom. In the style of Scholastic quaestiones disputatae, the clerics debate the classical arguments. The pious cleric criticizes and is unconvinced by each argument. In the second part, the impious cleric appeals to the tableau for events occurring twenty years in the future. The pious cleric has become a master in a monastery and, ironically, has become a partisan of the very arguments that he had earlier criticized. In the future scene, the master monitors and eventually enters a Socratic discussion between Probus, a young divine, and Caliste, a child. Probus defends the idea that God faces a partially open future precisely because God is perfect and must know, and therefore be affected by, what the creatures do. The scene closes as the master counters these arguments with the claim that the future is indeterminate for human perception but determinate for God. The final and shortest section returns to the clerics. The reprobate’s closing speech answers through bitter parodies the ideas that he has just heard uttered by his future self, the master. The speech reveals that the clerics are having dreams that will be mostly forgotten when they awake. The drama closes when they wake up, each remembering only the end of his dream: one singing with the angels, the other in agony with the demons. Satan, who appears for the first time, has the final word. He will lie in wait for one of the men to stumble.

The dialogue is operatic in its intricacy and drama; its philosophical argument is complex and rigorous. The intertwining of its literary and philosophical aspects is evident in the final pages when the clerics are made to forget the content of their shared dream. They must forget their dream in order for the revelation of the dream to come to pass without interference from the revelation itself. Likewise, Satan is not privy to the content of the dreams, so he must lie in wait, not knowing whether he will catch his prey. It is clear both from the tone of the dialogue and from other things that Lequyer wrote that the reprobate in the first and third parts and Probus in the second part are his spokespersons. The overall message of the dialogue is that the position on divine knowledge and human freedom that had been mapped out by Church theologians is nightmarish. Reform in both the meaning of freedom and how this affects ideas about God are in order. In short, the dialogue is a good example of Lequyer’s attempt to renew Christian philosophy. It should be said, however, that specifically Christian (and Jewish) ideas are used primarily by way of illustration and thus, it is less Christian philosophy than it is philosophical theology that is under consideration.

Lequyer was conversant with what most of the great theologians said about the foreknowledge puzzle—from Augustine and Boethius to Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, and John Duns Scotus. The concluding fragments of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? make clear that he rejected the Thomistic claim that the creatures can have no affect on God. The relation from the creatures to God, says Lequyer, is as real as the relation from God to the creatures [OC 73]. This rejection of Thomism follows from his analysis of freedom as a creative act that initiates causal chains. One’s free acts make the world, other persons, and even oneself, different than they otherwise would have been. Lequyer never doubted that God is the author of the universe, but the universe, he emphasized, includes free creatures. Thus, he speaks of “God, who created me creator of myself” [OC 70]. Aquinas explained that, in the proper sense of the word, creativity belongs to God alone; the creatures cannot create. For Lequyer, on the other hand, God has created creatures that are lesser creators. That they are God’s creation entails that they are dependent upon God, but since they are also creative they are in some measure independent of God. Because the acts of a free creature produce novel realities, they also create novel realities for God. In a striking turn of phrase, Lequyer says that the free acts of the creatures “make a spot in the absolute, which destroys the absolute” [OC 74].

Lequyer never doubts the omniscience of God. What is in doubt is what there is for God to know and how God comes by this knowledge. The dominant answers to these questions, expressed most thoroughly by Aquinas, were that God has detailed knowledge of the entire sweep of events in space and time—all that has been, is, and will be—and this knowledge is grounded in the fact that God created the universe. The deity has perfect self-knowledge and, as the cause of the world, knows the world as its effect. God’s creativity, according to the classical theory, has no temporal location, nor is omniscience hampered by time. Divine eternity, in the seminal statement of Boethius, is the whole, complete, simultaneous possession of endless life [compare OC 423]. Lequyer’s theory of free will challenges Aquinas’ view of the mechanics of omniscience. On Lequyer’s view, God cannot know human creative acts by virtue of creating them. To be sure, the ability to perform such acts is granted by God, but the acts themselves are products of the humans that make them and are not God’s doing. These lesser creative acts are the necessary condition of God’s knowledge of them; they create something in God that God could not know apart from their creativity. Their creative choices, moreover, are not re-enactments in time of what God decided for them in eternity, nor do they exist in eternity [OC 212]. It follows that they cannot be present to God in eternity. If it is a question of the free act of a creature, what is present to God is that such and such a person is undecided between courses of action and that both are equally possible. God too faces an open future precisely because more than one future is open to a creature to help create. In Lequyer’s words, “A frightful prodigy: man deliberates, and God waits!” [OC 71].

It is tempting to say that Lequyer offers a view of divine knowledge as limited. Lequyer demurs. As Probus explains, it is no more a limitation on God’s knowledge not to be able to know a future free act than it is a limitation on God’s power not to be able to create a square circle—the one is as impossible as the other [OC 171]. A future free act is, by its nature, indeterminate and must be known as such, even by God. Lequyer counsels that his view of divine knowledge only seems to be a limitation on God because we have an incorrect view of creativity. Prefiguring Henri Bergson, he speaks of the “magic in the view of accomplished deeds” that makes them appear, in retrospect, as though they were going to happen all along [OC 280; compare OC 419]. Lequyer—through Probus—speaks of divine self-limitation, but this is arguably an infelicitous way for him to make his case [OC 171]. It is not as though God could remove blinders or exert a little more power and achieve the knowledge of an as yet to be enacted free decision. Prior to the free decision, there is nothing more to be known than possibilities (and probabilities); by exerting more power, God could deprive the decision of its freedom, but it would, by the nature of the case, no longer be a free decision that God was foreseeing. Lequyer argues, however, that one may freely set in motion a series of events that make it impossible for one’s future self to accomplish some desired end. In that case, it would have been impossible for God to foreknow the original free decision, but God would infallibly know the result once the decision had been made.

Lequyer does not tire of stressing that if God is omniscient, then God must know the extent to which the future is open at any given juncture [OC 205]. Recall that Lequyer is mindful of how easily we fool ourselves into thinking we are free when we are not. We mistake merely imagined possibilities for real possibilities. God is not subject to this limitation. For these reasons, his view of divine creativity and knowledge allows for a significant degree of providential control, although there can be no absolute guarantees that everything God might wish to occur will occur. Risk remains. Lequyer disparages the idea that every detail of the world is willed by God; this view of divine power, he says, yields “imitations of life” that make of the work of God something frivolous [OC 212]. Even if creatures are ignorant of the extent of their freedom, free will is nonetheless real and so the world is no puppet show. When it comes to the question of prophecy, Lequyer emphasizes how often biblical prophecies are warnings rather than predictions. Those involving predictions, especially of free acts (for example, Peter’s denials of Christ and Judas’ betrayal), can be accounted for, he avers, by highlighting human ignorance and pride in comparison with divine knowledge of the extent to which the future is open [compare OC 206-07]. God is able to see into the heart of a person to know perfectly what is still open for the person not to do and what is certain that he or she will do. On Lequyer’s view, a deed for which a person is held accountable must be free in its origin but not necessarily in its consequences. One may freely make decisions that deprive one’s future self of freedom, but this does not relieve the person of moral accountability [OC 211].

A peculiarity of Lequyer’s theory as it appears in Probus is that he denies the law of non-contradiction where future contingents are concerned. In this, he follows what he understood (and what some commentators understand) to be Aristotle’s views. Lequyer claims that it is true to say of things past or present that they either are or they are not. On the other hand, for future contingents (like free decisions that might go one way or another), Lequyer says that both are false; where A is a future contingent, both A-will-be and A-will-not-be are false [OC 194]. Doubtless this is the least plausible aspect of Lequyer’s views since abandoning the law of non-contradiction is an extremely heavy price to pay for an open future. It is interesting to speculate, however, on what he would have thought of Charles Hartshorne’s view that the contradictory of A-will-be is A-may-not-be and the contradictory of A-will-not-be is A-may-be. This makes A-will-be and A-will-not-be contraries rather than contradictories. As in Aristotle’s square, contraries may both be false; in this way, Lequyer could have achieved at no damage to elementary logic a doctrine of an open future. He certainly leaned in this direction in the closing pages of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? There, he declares that it is contradictory to say that a thing will be and that it is entirely possible that it may not be [OC 75].

Besides Probus, the curiously titled Abel and Abel—Esau and Jacob: Biblical Narrative is Lequyer’s other major work that addresses specifically religious themes. As the title suggests, it is closely tied to biblical motifs. Although it is yet another exploration of the idea of freedom, the examination of philosophical arguments is replaced by a fiction informed by philosophical ideas. Lequyer imagines an old man of Judea, living a little after the time of Christ, who has quoted St. Paul to his grandson that God preferred Jacob to Esau before their birth (Romans 9.11). The child is astonished and saddened by the statement, because it seems to place God’s goodness in doubt. The old man tells a story to the child that is designed to help explain the enigma. The tale, set some generations after Jacob and Esau, concerns the identical twin sons—identical even in their names, “Abel”—of a widowed patriarch, Aram. Before telling this story, however, he recounts the biblical episode of Abraham’s attempted sacrifice of Isaac (Gen. 22). He explains that he wishes the grandson to be reminded of Isaac under Abraham’s knife when he tells the story of the Abels, saying, “Faith is a victory; for a great victory, there must be a great conflict” [OC 235]. In the epilogue, the wizened grandfather gives what amounts to a Christian midrash on the story of Jacob and Esau with special attention to Jacob’s wrestling with the angel (Gen. 32.24-32). Thus, the story of the Abel twins is intercalated between two biblical stories. The theme uniting the three stories is God’s tests and the possible responses to them.

The Abel twins are as alike as twins could be, sharing thoughts and sometimes even dreams, but always in bonds of love for one another. They are introduced to an apparent injustice that saddens them when two brothers, slaves of their father, commit a theft and Aram pardons one but punishes the other. The seeming unfairness of the slave’s punishment reminds the twins of Esau’s complaint that he had been cheated when his brother Jacob stole their father’s blessing from him (Gen. 27). The Abels come close to passing judgment on their own father for treating the guilty slaves unequally. They resist the thought and then are told by Eliezer, the senior servant in the household, that Aram recognized the slave he condemned as having led his companions into some misdeed prior to having committed the theft. The boys are relieved to hear their father vindicated. His judgment of the slaves only seemed unjust to the twins because they lacked information that their father possessed. The episode of the unequally treated thieves serves as a parable counseling faith in the justice of God even when God seems to act in morally arbitrary ways.

The twins themselves must also face the test of being treated unequally. Aram shows them an elaborately decorated cedar ark. He explains that the day will come when one of the twins will be favored over the other to open the ark and discover inside the name which God reserves for him and his brother. Mysteriously, the name will apply to both of them but it will separate them as well. The dreams of the twins are disturbed by this favor that will separate them. Aram leaves, perhaps never to return again, giving charge of his sons to Eliezer. After a time, Eliezer brings the boys again to the cedar ark and there explains to them the decree of Aram. The favored son will be given a ring to denote that he is the chosen of God. The other son may either submit to his brother or depart from the country with a third of Aram’s inheritance, leaving the other two-thirds of the wealth for the chosen Abel. Their father’s possessions are great, so to receive a third of the inheritance is a significant amount. Nevertheless, the fact remains that the twins, equal in every way, will have been treated unequally by Aram’s decree.

It is not given to the child who is being told the story of the Abel twins (or to the reader) to know the outcome of their trial. Instead, he is told of three mutually exclusive ways in which the story could go, depending on how the brothers respond to their unequal treatment. In the first scenario, the favored Abel succumbs to pride and his brother shows resentment. Calling to mind the name of the first murderer in the Bible, Lequyer writes, “And, behind the sons of Aram, Satan who was promising himself two Cains from these two Abels, was laughing” [OC 265]. In the second scenario, the favored brother refuses the gift out of a generous feeling for his brother. In that case, Lequyer says that the favored Abel can be called “the Invincible.” In the third scenario, the favored brother, in great sorrow for what his brother has not received, accepts the ring while the other Abel, out of love for his twin, rejoices in his brother’s gift and helps him to open the gilded cedar chest. Lequyer says that, in this case, the other Abel can be called “the Victorious.” Lequyer presents the three scenarios in the order in which he believes they ought to be valued, from the least (the first scenario) to the greatest (the third scenario). When the ark is opened the mystery is revealed of the single name that is given to the brothers that nevertheless distinguishes them. Written within are the words: YOUR NAME IS: THAT WHICH YOU WERE IN THE TEST [OC 276]. The test was to see how the twins would respond to the apparent injustice of one being favored over the other. In effect, God’s predestined name for the brothers is like a mathematical variable whose value will be determined by the choices that the brothers make in response to the test.

Lequyer is clear that the lesson of Abel and Abel is not simply that God respects the free will of the twins. One also learns that God’s richer gifts may be more in what is denied than in what is given [OC 271]. Put somewhat differently, the denial of a gift may itself be a gift of an opportunity to exercise one’s freedom in the best possible way. To be sure, the favored Abel has his own opportunities. By accepting the ring, graciously and without pride, he is a noble figure. He is greater still (“the Invincible”) if he refuses the ring out of love for his brother. It is open to the other Abel, however, to win an incomparable victory (signified by the name, “the Victorious”) should his brother accept the ring. He is victorious over the apparent injustice done to him and over the resentment and envy he might have felt. He has been given a great opportunity to exhibit a higher virtue and he has taken it. In Lequyer’s words, “It is sweet to be loved . . . but it is far sweeter to love” [OC 272]; he argues that one can be loved without finding pleasure in it, although this may be a fault, but one cannot love without feeling joy. It should also be noted that by becoming “the Victorious” the other Abel in no way diminishes the virtue or the reward open to his twin. In this way, Lequyer avers, one may go far in vindicating God’s justice as well as God’s magnificence (that is, giving more to a person than is strictly merited by their deeds). This is a long way from a complete theodicy but Lequyer surely meant these reflections to be an important contribution to a renewal of Christian philosophy.

In the epilogue Lequyer reemphasizes the importance of accepting the will of God even when it seems harsh. The grandfather returns to the story of Jacob and Esau whose unequal treatment so saddened the grandson in the first place. According to the grandfather’s imaginative retelling, Jacob was tested by God when he wrestled with the angel. As Jacob anxiously awaits the arrival of Esau who had vowed to kill him (Gen. 27.41), he is filled with terror contemplating “the stubbornness of the Lord’s goodwill” in allowing him to buy Esau’s birthright (Gen. 25.29-33) and to steal Isaac’s blessing [OC 296]. Perhaps he fears that Esau will finally exact God’s judgment against him. A stranger approaches Jacob from the shadows and demands to know whether he will bless the name of God even if God should strike him. Jacob promises to bless God. He is shown several terrifying episodes in his future, from the rape of his daughter Dinah (Gen. 34.1-5) to the presumed death of his son Joseph (Gen. 37.33). In the final vision, a perfectly righteous man he does not recognize suffers an ignominious death on a cross. After each vision, Jacob “wrestles” with the temptation to impiety but instead blesses God’s name. Jacob is thus found worthy of the favors bestowed upon him. As the stranger leaves, Jacob sees his face and recognizes it as the face of the man on the cross. When morning comes, Esau arrives and greets his brother with kisses of fraternal love (Gen. 33.4).

Probus and Abel and Abel address different problems and in very different styles. Yet, in some sense they are a diptych, to borrow the apt metaphor of André Clair. Each work deals with a different kind of necessity. The necessity in Probus (also in How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?) is that of deterministic causes resulting inevitably in certain effects, included among the latter, one’s supposedly free decisions. The necessity in Abel and Abel is the inalterability of the past, especially as it pertains to Aram’s decree. The decree sets the conditions of the test but does not determine its outcome. This is very different from the decree of damnation of the unhappy cleric. The tableau of God’s foreknowledge includes every detail of how the cleric will act in the future. In the dialogue, there is no equivalent of the “name” that is written in the cedar ark, no variable whose value can be decided by one’s free choice. Indeed, Probus can be read as an extended reductio against traditional teachings about foreknowledge and predestination. The predestinate fails to console the reprobate. There can be no hope for him for he knows with certainty that he will be damned. The dialogue, however, offers hope for the reader, the hope of breaking free of a nightmarish theology by rethinking the concepts of freedom and the nature of God along the lines that the character of Probus suggests—after all, Probus is the name of the dialogue. Abel and Abel reinforces the idea that God faces a relatively open future. The story does not tell which of the three options is chosen, nor does it suggest that one of them is predestined to occur.

The story of the Abel twins goes beyond the dialogue, however, by returning to the question raised in How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? of how self-identity is constructed. Clair argues convincingly that Lequyer means to generalize from the Abel twins to all human beings. The twins represent the fact that one’s self-identity is not merely a question of not being someone else. They are different from each other but neither acquires a new “name”—that is, a distinctive identity—apart from exercising their freedom in response to the test. This is consistent with Lequyer’s theme of the self as a product of self-creative acts, although the self-creativity of the twins most clearly manifests itself in relation to other persons. In Abel and Abel, there is a shift in the question of self-creativity from metaphysics to axiology. The fulfillment of self-creativity, which is to say its highest manifestation, is in love. The “I” of self-creativity becomes inseparable from the “we”. Lequyer appropriates this idea for theology in his reflections on the Trinity. He says that a Divine Love that cannot say “You” to one that is equal to itself would be inconsolable by the eternal absence of its object [Abel et Abel 1991, 101]. If God is love, as Christianity maintains (I John 4.8), then the unity of God requires a plurality within the Godhead.

4. Philosophical Legacy

Renouvier once said that he saved Lequyer’s work from sinking [Esquisse d’une classification systématique, v. 2, 382]. In view of Lequyer’s drowning, it is a fitting if somewhat macabre metaphor. Renouvier often quoted his friend’s work at length in his own books. His edition of The Search for a First Truth, limited though it was to one-hundred and twenty copies, ensured that Lequyer’s philosophy was presented in something like a form of which he would have approved. Renouvier included a brief “Editor’s Preface” but his name appears nowhere in the book. In publishing the book, it was his friend’s contribution to philosophy that he intended to preserve and celebrate, not his own. More widely available editions of the book were published in 1924 and 1993. Another indication of Renouvier’s respect is the marker he was instrumental in erecting over Lequyer’s grave. The inscription reads in part, “to the memory of an unhappy friend and a man of great genius.” Throughout his career he called Lequyer his “master” on the subject of free will and he took meticulous care in attributing to Lequyer the ideas that he borrowed from him. In Renouvier’s last conversations, as recorded by his disciple Louis Prat, he quoted Lequyer’s maxim, “TO MAKE . . . and, in making, TO MAKE ONESELF” as a summary of his own philosophy of personalism [Derniers entretiens, 64].

Others did not take as much care as Renouvier in giving Lequyer the credit that he was due. William James learned of Lequyer from reading Renouvier’s works and wrote to him in 1872 inquiring about The Search for a First Truth which he had not been able to locate through a bookstore. Renouvier sent him a copy which he read, at least in part, and which he donated to the Harvard Library. The essential elements of James’s mature views on free will and determinism closely parallel those of Lequyer—freedom is not merely acting in accordance with the will, the impossibility of experiencing freedom, the importance of effort of attention in the phenomenon of will, the reality of chance, the theoretical impasse between freedom and necessity, and the idea that freedom rightly affirms its own reality. James’s Oxford Street/Divinity Avenue thought experiment in his essay “The Dilemma of Determinism” could be interpreted as an application of a similar passage in the third section of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? [OC 52]. There are, to be sure, profound differences between James and Lequyer on many subjects, but where it is a question of free will and determinism the similarities are uncanny.

James always credited Renouvier for framing the issue of free will in terms of “the ambiguity of futures,” but it is clear that Renouvier was a conduit for the ideas of Lequyer. This is nowhere more evident than in James’s 1876 review of two books, by Alexander Bain and Renouvier, published in the Nation. He praises Renouvier’s ideas about freedom, but the views he highlights are the very ideas that Renouvier attributed to Lequyer. In one instance, he confuses a quote from Lequyer as belonging to Renouvier. The unwary reader, like James, assumes that it is Renouvier speaking. In his personal letters James mentions Lequyer by name, but not in any of his works written for publication. It is clear, however, that he thought highly of him. In The Principles of Psychology (1890), James mentions “a French philosopher of genius” and quotes a phrase from the concluding section of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? He cites the same phrase, slightly altered, in Some Problems of Philosophy but again not revealing the name of its author [For references, see Viney 1997/2009].

Another famous philosopher who quoted Lequyer without mentioning his name is Jean-Paul Sartre. Sartre may have learned of Lequyer in 1935 when he sat on the board of editors for the Nouvelle Revue Française. The board was considering whether to publish Grenier’s doctoral thesis, La Philosophie de Jules Lequier. The decision was against publication, but not without Sartre objecting that there was still interest among readers in freedom. In 1944, Sartre responded to critics of existentialism and affirmed as his own, the saying, “to make and in making to make oneself and to be nothing except what one has made of oneself.” This is a nearly direct quote from Lequyer. Jean Wahl, who edited a selection of Lequyer’s writings, maintained that Sartre borrowed the principle idea of L’existentialisme est un humanisme (1945) from Lequyer, to wit, that in making our own choices, we are our own creators. Lequyer is not quoted in that presentation. Seven years later, however, in a discussion of Stéphane Mallarmé’s poetry, Sartre again mentions Lequyer’s maxim, placing it in quotation marks, but without reference to the name of the Breton. If one may speak of Lequyer’s anonymous influence on James, one may perhaps speak of Lequyer’s anonymous shadow in the work of Sartre [For references see Viney 2010, 13-14].

The irony in Sartre’s quotations of Lequyer’s maxim is that he uses it not only to express a belief in freedom but also to express his atheism. Sartre rejected the idea that, God creates creatures in accordance with a detailed conception of what they will be. This is what Sartre would characterize as essence preceding existence. The formula of Sartre’s existentialism is that existence precedes essence. In Sartre’s words, it is not the case that “the individual man is the realization of a certain concept in the divine understanding” [Existentialisme est un humanisme, 28]. Of course, Lequyer agrees, but rather than adopting atheism he opted for revising the concept of God as one capable of creating other, lesser, creators. Grenier outlined Lequyer’s theology in his dissertation (just mentioned) but there is no indication—unless his silence says something—of what Sartre thought of it. Other philosophers, however, did not remain silent on Lequyer’s suggestions for revising traditional ideas about God.

After Renouvier, Grenier, and Wahl, the philosopher who made most explicit use of Lequyer’s ideas and promoted their importance was the American Charles Hartshorne. Hartshorne learned of Lequyer from Wahl in Paris in 1948. By that time, Hartshorne was far along in his career with well-developed views of his own in what is known as process philosophy and theology. Nevertheless, he thereafter consistently promoted Lequyer’s significance as a forerunner of process thought. He often quoted the Lequyerian phrase, “God created me creator of myself” and cited Lequyer as the first philosopher to clearly affirm a bilateral influence between God and the creatures. With Hartshorne, Lequyer ceased being, as in James and Sartre, the anonymously cited philosopher. Hartshorne included the first English language excerpt from Lequyer’s writings in his anthology, edited with William L. Reese, Philosophers Speak of God (1953).

Harvey H. Brimmer II (1934-1990), one of Hartshorne’s students, wrote a dissertation titled Jules Lequier and Process Philosophy (1975), which included as appendices translations of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? and Probus. This was the first book-length study of Lequyer in English. Brimmer argued, among other things, that the distinction for which Hartshorne is known between the existence/essence of God and the actuality of God is implicit in Lequyer’s thought. According to this idea, God’s essential nature (including the divine existence) is immutable and necessary but God is ever open to new experiences as the particular objects of God’s power, knowledge, and goodness, which are contingent, come to be. For example, it is God’s nature to know whatever exists, but the existence of this particular bird singing is contingent, and so God’s knowledge of it is contingent. Brimmer seems to be on firm footing, for Lequyer says both that God is unchanging but that there can be a change in God [OC 74, compare OC 243].

Hartshorne’s admiration for Lequyer introduced, if unintentionally, its own distortion, as though the only things that matter about Lequyer were the ways in which he anticipated process thought. It may be more accurate, for example, to interpret Lequyer as a forerunner of an evangelical “open theism”—at least a Catholic version—than of process philosophy’s version of divine openness. For example, Lequyer and the evangelical open theists affirm but Hartshorne denies the divine inspiration of the Bible and the doctrine of creation ex nihilo. We may, nevertheless, accentuate the positive by noting that many of Lequyer’s central ideas are incarnated in each variety of open theism. Also noteworthy is that some of those evangelicals who identify themselves as open theists—William Hasker, Richard Rice, and Gregory Boyd—were influenced to a greater or lesser extent by Hartshorne. That Lequyer is an important, if not the most important, pioneer of an open view of God cannot be doubted. Moreover, the combination of literary imagination and philosophical rigor that he brought to the exploration of an open view of God, especially in Probus and Abel and Abel, is unmatched.

The philosopher to whom Lequyer is most often compared is Kierkegaard. Each philosopher endeavored, in the words of Clair, to “think the singular” [Title of Clair 1993]. They would not allow, after the manner of Hegel, a dialectical aufheben in which, they believed, the individual is swallowed by the absolute [OC 347]. Choice and responsibility are central themes for both philosophers. The same can be said of the subject of faith and the “audacity and passion” (Lequyer) that it requires [OC 501]. Both men blurred the line between literature and philosophy, as often happens in superior spirits. Perhaps the best example of this is that they developed what might be called the art of Christian midrash, amending biblical narratives from their own imaginations to shed new light on the text. As Lequyer said in a Kierkegaardian tone, the Scriptures have “extraordinary silences” [OC 231]. Lequyer’s treatment of the story of Abraham and Isaac bears some similarities with what one finds in Kierkegaard’s Fear and Trembling. Both philosophers warn against reading the story in reverse as though Abraham knew all along that God would not allow Isaac to die. Lequyer says that Abraham faced a terrifying reversal of all things human and divine.

If there is a common idea that unites Lequyer and Kierkegaard it is the revitalization of Christianity. Yet, this commonality begins to dissolve under a multitude of qualifications. Kierkegaard’s criticisms of the established church in Denmark were in the truest spirit of Protestantism. Except for an early period of emotional detachment from the church, Lequyer was loyal to Catholicism. The renewal of Christianity meant something different for each philosopher. Kierkegaard spoke of reintroducing Christianity into Christendom and he maintained that the thought behind his whole work was what it means to become a Christian. A distant analogy in Lequyer’s polemic to what Kierkegaard calls “Christendom” is the reasoning of the doctors of the church. Lequyer says that the reasoning of the doctors never had any power over him, even as a child [OC 13]. Whereas Kierkegaard launched an assault on the idea of identifying an institution with Christianity, Lequyer targets the theologians whose theories he believes undercut belief in the freedom of God and of the creatures. Lequyer’s willingness to engage medieval theology on its own terms, matching argument with argument in an attempt to develop a more adequate, logically consistent, and coherent concept of God, stands in contrast to Kierkegaard’s negative dialectic that leads to faith embracing paradox.

5. Conclusion

Lequyer wrote to Renouvier in 1850 that he was writing “something unheard of” [OC 538]. The way in which his ideas and his words have sometimes been invoked without mention of his name makes this sadly ironic. Too often he has been heard from but without himself being heard of. Until recently, the unavailability of his writings in translation tended to confine detailed knowledge of his work to francophones. To make matters more difficult, as Grenier noted, he is something of an απαξ (hapax)—one of a kind. His philosophy does not readily fit any classification or historical development of ideas. Grenier wryly commented on those eager to classify philosophical schools and movements: “Meteors do not have a right to exist because they enter under no nomenclature” [Grenier 1951, 33]. The same metaphor, used more positively, is invoked by Wahl in his edition of Lequyer’s writings. Lequyer, he remarked, left mostly fragments of philosophy, but he left “brief and vivid trails” in the philosophical firmament.

Lequyer worked outside the philosophical mainstream. Yet, he can be regarded, in the expression of Xavier Tilliette, as a scout or a precursor of such diverse movements as personalism, pragmatism, existentialism, and openness theologies. Of course, it is an honor to be considered in such a light. On the other hand, like a point on the horizon on which lines converge, the distinctiveness and integrity of Lequyer’s own point-of-view is in danger of being lost by such a multitude of comparisons. It does not help matters that Lequyer failed to complete his life’s work. It is often reminiscent of Pascal’s Pensées: nuggets of insight and suggestions for argument are scattered throughout the drafts that he made of his thought. In any event, Goulven Le Brech’s assessment seems secure: “The fragmentary and unfinished work of Jules Lequier is far from having given up all its secrets” [Cahiers Jules Lequier, v. 1, 5].

6. References and Further Reading

  • The abbreviation “OC” refers to OEuvres complètes, Jean Grenier’s edition of Lequyer’s works published in 1952. “Hémon” refers to Prosper Hémon’s biography of Lequyer published in Abel et Abel (1991).
  • The Fonds Jules Lequier [Jules Lequier Archives] are at the University of Rennes. Beginning in 2010, Les amis de Jules Lequier has published annually, under the editorship of Le Brech, Cahiers Jules Lequier [Jules Lequier Notebooks] which includes articles, archival material, and previously published but difficult to find material.

a. Primary Sources

  • Lequier, Jules. 1865. La Recherche d’une première vérité, fragments posthumes [The Search for a First Truth, Postumous Fragments]. Edited by Charles Renouvier. (Saint-Cloud, Impr. de Mme Vve Belin).
  • Lequier, Jules. 1924. La Recherche d’une première vérité, fragments posthumes, recueillis par Charles Renouvier. Notice biographique, par Ludovic Dugas. Paris: Librairie Armand Colin. Dugas’ 58 page introductory essay, titled “La Vie, l’Œuvre et le Génie de Lequier” [The Life, Work, and Genius of Lequier], draws heavily on Hémon’s biography (see Lequier 1991).
  • Lequier, Jules. 1936. La Liberté [Freedom]. Textes inédits présentes par Jean Grenier. Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1948. Jules Lequier. Textes présentes par Jean Wahl. Les Classiques de la Liberté. Genève et Paris: Editions des Trois Collines.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1952. Œuvres complètes [Complete Works]. Édition de Jean Grenier. Neuchâtel, Suisse: Éditions de la Baconnière.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1985. Comment trouver, comment chercher une première vérité? Suivi de “Le Murmure de Lequier (vie imaginaire)” par Michel Valensi [How to find, how to search for a first truth? Followed by “The Murmure of Lequier (imaginary life)”]. Préface de Claude Morali. Paris: Éditions de l’éclat.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1991. Abel et Abel, suivi d’une “Notice Biographique de Jules Lequyer” [Abel and Abel followed by “A Biographical Notice of JulesLequyer”] par Prosper Hémon. Édition de G. Pyguillem. Combas: Éditions de l’Éclat. Hémon’s biography, though incomplete, is the first and most extensively researched biography of the philosopher. It was written at the end of the nineteenth century.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1993. La Recherche d’une première vérité et autres textes, édition établie et présenté par André Clair. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Lequier, Jules. 2010. La Fourche et la quenouille [The Fork and the Distaff], préface et notes par Goulven Le Brech. Bédée : Éditions Folle Avoine.

b. English Translations

  • Brimmer, Harvey H. [with Jacqueline Delobel]. 1974. “Jules Lequier’s ‘The Hornbeam Leaf’” Philosophy in Context, 3: 94-100.
  • Brimmer, Harvey H. and Jacqueline Delobel. 1975. Translations of The Problem of Knowledge (which includes “The Hornbeam Leaf”) (pp. 291-354) and Probus, or the Principle of Knowledge (pp. 362-467). The translations are included as an appendix to Brimmer’s Jules Lequier and Process Philosophy (Doctoral Dissertation, Emory University, 1975), Dissertation Abstracts International, 36, 2892A.
  • Hartshorne, Charles and William L. Reese, editors. 1953. Philosophers Speak of God. University of Chicago Press: 227-230. Contains brief selections from Probus.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1998. Translation of Works of Jules Lequyer: The Hornbeam Leaf, The Dialogue of the Predestinate and the Reprobate, Eugene and Theophilus. Foreword by Robert Kane. Lewiston, New York: The Edwin Mellen Press.
  • West, Mark. 1999. Jules Lequyer’s “Abel and Abel” Followed by “Incidents in the Life and Death of Jules Lequyer.” Translation by Mark West; Biography by Donald Wayne Viney. Foreword by William L. Reese. Lewiston, New York: The Edwin Mellen Press.

c. Secondary Sources in French and English

  • Brimmer, Harvey H. 1967. “Lequier (Joseph Louis) Jules.” The Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Edited by Paul Edwards. Volume 4: 438-439. New York: Macmillan.
  • Clair, André. 2000. Métaphysique et existence: essai sur la philosophie de Jules Lequier. Bibliothèque d’histoire de la philosophie, Nouvelle série. Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Grenier, Jean. 1936. La Philosophie de Jules Lequier. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Grenier, Jean. 1951. “Un grand philosophe inconnu et méconnu: Jules Lequier” [A great philosopher unknown and unrecognized]. Rencontre, no ll. Lausanne (novembre): 31-39.
  • Le Brech, Goulven. 2007. Jules Lequier. Rennes : La Part Commune.
  • Pyguillem, Gérard. 1985. “Renouvier et sa publication des fragments posthumes de J. Lequier,” [Renouvier and the publication of the posthumous fragments of J. Lequier]. Archives de Philosophie, 48: 653-668.
  • Séailles, Gabriel. 1898. “Un philosophe inconnu, Jules Lequier.” [An unknown philosopher, Jules Lequier]. Revue Philosophique de la France et de L’Etranger. Tome XLV: 120-150.
  • Tilliette, Xavier. 1964. Jules Lequier ou le tourment de la liberté. [Jules Lequier or the torment of freedom]. Paris: Desclée de Brouwer.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1987. “Faith as a Creative Act: Kierkegaard and Lequier on the Relation of Faith and Reason.” Faith & Creativity: Essays in Honor of Eugene H. Peters. Edited by George Nordgulen and George W. Shields. St. Louis, Missouri: CBP Press: 165-177.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1997. “William James on Free Will: The French Connection.” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 14/1 (October): 29-52. Republished in The Reception of Pragmatism in France & the Rise of Roman Catholic Modernism, 1890-1914, edited by David G. Schultenover, S. J. (Washington, D. C.: The Catholic University of America Press, 2009): 93-121.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1997. “Jules Lequyer and the Openness of God.” Faith and Philosophy, 14/2 (April): 1-24.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1999. “The Nightmare of Necessity: Jules Lequyer’s Dialogue of the Predestinate and the Reprobate.” Journal of the Association of the Interdisciplinary Study of the Arts 5/1 (Autumn): 17-30.
  • Vinson, Alain. 1992. “L’Idée d’éternité chez Jules Lequier.” [The Idea of Eternity According to Jules Lequier]. Les Études Philosophique, numéro 2 (Avril-Juin) (Philosophie française): 179-193.

Author Information

Donald Wayne Viney
Pittsburg State University
U. S. A.

The Evidential Problem of Evil

The evidential problem of evil is the problem of determining whether and, if so, to what extent the existence of evil (or certain instances, kinds, quantities, or distributions of evil) constitutes evidence against the existence of God, that is to say, a being perfect in power, knowledge and goodness. Evidential arguments from evil attempt to show that, once we put aside any evidence there might be in support of the existence of God, it becomes unlikely, if not highly unlikely, that the world was created and is governed by an omnipotent, omniscient, and wholly good being. Such arguments are not to be confused with logical arguments from evil, which have the more ambitious aim of showing that, in a world in which there is evil, it is logically impossible—and not just unlikely—that God exists.

This entry begins by clarifying some important concepts and distinctions associated with the problem of evil, before providing an outline of one of the more forceful and influential evidential arguments developed in contemporary times, namely, the evidential argument advanced by William Rowe. Rowe’s argument has occasioned a range of responses from theists, including the so-called "skeptical theist" critique (according to which God’s ways are too mysterious for us to comprehend) and the construction of various theodicies, that is, explanations as to why God permits evil. These and other responses to the evidential problem of evil are here surveyed and assessed.

Table of Contents

  1. Background to the Problem of Evil
    1. Orthodox Theism
    2. Good and Evil
    3. Versions of the Problem of Evil
  2. William Rowe’s Evidential Argument from Evil
    1. An Outline of Rowe’s Evidential Argument
    2. The Theological Premise
    3. The Factual Premise
      1. Rowe’s Case in Support of the Factual Premise
      2. The Inference from P to Q
  3. The Skeptical Theist Response
    1. Wykstra’s CORNEA Critique
    2. Wykstra’s Parent Analogy
    3. Alston’s Analogies
  4. Building a Theodicy, or Casting Light on the Ways of God
    1. What is a Theodicy?
    2. Distinguishing a "Theodicy" from a "Defence"
    3. Sketch of a Theodicy
  5. Further Responses to the Evidential Problem of Evil
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Background to the Problem of Evil

Before delving into the deep and often murky waters of the problem of evil, it will be helpful to provide some philosophical background to this venerable subject. The first and perhaps most important step of this stage-setting process will be to identify and clarify the conception of God that is normally presupposed in contemporary debates (at least within the Anglo-American analytic tradition) on the problem of evil. The next step will involve providing an outline of some important concepts and distinctions, in particular the age-old distinction between "good" and "evil," and the more recent distinction between the logical problem of evil and the evidential problem of evil.

a. Orthodox Theism

The predominant conception of God within the western world, and hence the kind of deity that is normally the subject of debate in discussions on the problem of evil in most western philosophical circles, is the God of "orthodox theism." According to orthodox theism, there exists just one God, this God being a person or person-like. The operative notion, however, behind this form of theism is that God is perfect, where to be perfect is to be the greatest being possible or, to borrow Anselm’s well-known phrase, the being than which none greater can be conceived. (Such a conception of God forms the starting-point in what has come to be known as "perfect being theology"; see Morris 1987, 1991, and Rogers 2000). On this view, God, as an absolutely perfect being, must possess the following perfections or great-making qualities:

  1. omnipotence: This refers to God’s ability to bring about any state of affairs that is logically possible in itself as well as logically consistent with his other essential attributes.
  2. omniscience: God is omniscient in that he knows all truths or knows all that is logically possible to know.
  3. perfect goodness: God is the source of moral norms (as in divine command ethics) or always acts in complete accordance with moral norms.
  4. aseity: God has aseity (literally, being from oneself, a se esse) – that is to say, he is self-existent or ontologically independent, for he does not depend either for his existence or for his characteristics on anything outside himself.
  5. incorporeality: God has no body; he is a non-physical spirit but is capable of affecting physical things.
  6. eternity: Traditionally, God is thought to be eternal in an atemporal sense—that is, God is timeless or exists outside of time (a view upheld by Augustine, Boethius, and Aquinas). On an alternative view, God’s eternality is held to be temporal in nature, so that God is everlasting or exists in time, having infinite temporal duration in both of the two temporal directions.
  7. omnipresence: God is wholly present in all space and time. This is often interpreted metaphorically to mean that God can bring about an event immediately at any place and time, and knows what is happening at every place and time in the same immediate manner.
  8. perfectly free: God is absolutely free either in the sense that nothing outside him can determine him to perform a particular action, or in the sense that it is always within his power not to do what he does.
  9. alone worthy of worship and unconditional commitment: God, being the greatest being possible, is the only being fit to be worshipped and the only being to whom one may commit one’s life without reservation.

The God of traditional theism is also typically accorded a further attribute, one that he is thought to possess only contingently:

  1. creator and sustainer of the world: God brought the (physical and non-physical) world into existence, and also keeps the world and every object within it in existence. Thus, no created thing could exist at a given moment unless it were at that moment held in existence by God. Further, no created thing could have the causal powers and liabilities it has at a given moment unless it were at that moment supplied with those powers and liabilities by God.

According to orthodox theism, God was free not to create a world. In other words, there is at least one possible world in which God creates nothing at all. But then God is a creator only contingently, not necessarily. (For a more comprehensive account of the properties of the God of orthodox theism, see Swinburne 1977, Quinn & Taliaferro 1997: 223-319, and Hoffman & Rosenkrantz 2002.)

b. Good and Evil

Clarifying the underlying conception of God is but the first step in clarifying the nature of the problem of evil. To arrive at a more complete understanding of this vexing problem, it is necessary to unpack further some of its philosophical baggage. I turn, therefore, to some important concepts and distinctions associated with the problem of evil, beginning with the ideas of "good" and "evil."

The terms "good" and "evil" are, if nothing else, notoriously difficult to define. Some account, however, can be given of these terms as they are employed in discussions of the problem of evil. Beginning with the notion of evil, this is normally given a very wide extension so as to cover everything that is negative and destructive in life. The ambit of evil will therefore include such categories as the bad, the unjust, the immoral, and the painful. An analysis of evil in this broad sense may proceed as follows:

An event may be categorized as evil if it involves any of the following:

  1. some harm (whether it be minor or great) being done to the physical and/or psychological well-being of a sentient creature;
  2. the unjust treatment of some sentient creature;
  3. loss of opportunity resulting from premature death;
  4. anything that prevents an individual from leading a fulfilling and virtuous life;
  5. a person doing that which is morally wrong;
  6. the "privation of good."

Condition (a) captures what normally falls under the rubric of pain as a physical state (for example, the sensation you feel when you have a toothache or broken jaw) and suffering as a mental state in which we wish that our situation were otherwise (for example, the experience of anxiety or despair). Condition (b) introduces the notion of injustice, so that the prosperity of the wicked, the demise of the virtuous, and the denial of voting rights or employment opportunities to women and blacks would count as evils. The third condition is intended to cover cases of untimely death, that is to say, death not brought about by the ageing process alone. Death of this kind may result in loss of opportunity either in the sense that one is unable to fulfill one’s potential, dreams or goals, or merely in the sense that one is prevented from living out the full term of their natural life. This is partly why we consider it a great evil if an infant were killed after impacting with a train at full speed, even if the infant experienced no pain or suffering in the process. Condition (d) classifies as evil anything that inhibits one from leading a life that is both fulfilling and virtuous – poverty and prostitution would be cases in point. Condition (e) relates evil to immoral choices or acts. And the final condition expresses the idea, prominent in Augustine and Aquinas, that evil is not a substance or entity in its own right, but a privatio boni: the absence or lack of some good power or quality which a thing by its nature ought to possess.

Paralleling the above analysis of evil, the following account of "good" may be offered:

An event may be categorized as good if it involves any of the following:

  1. some improvement (whether it be minor or great) in the physical and/or psychological well-being of a sentient creature;
  2. the just treatment of some sentient creature;
  3. anything that advances the degree of fulfillment and virtue in an individual’s life;
  4. a person doing that which is morally right;
  5. the optimal functioning of some person or thing, so that it does not lack the full measure of being and goodness that ought to belong to it.

Turning to the many varieties of evil, the following have become standard in the literature:

Moral evil. This is evil that results from the misuse of free will on the part of some moral agent in such a way that the agent thereby becomes morally blameworthy for the resultant evil. Moral evil therefore includes specific acts of intentional wrongdoing such as lying and murdering, as well as defects in character such as dishonesty and greed.

Natural evil. In contrast to moral evil, natural evil is evil that results from the operation of natural processes, in which case no human being can be held morally accountable for the resultant evil. Classic examples of natural evil are natural disasters such as cyclones and earthquakes that result in enormous suffering and loss of life, illnesses such as leukemia and Alzheimer’s, and disabilities such as blindness and deafness.

An important qualification, however, must be made at this point. A great deal of what normally passes as natural evil is brought about by human wrongdoing or negligence. For example, lung cancer may be caused by heavy smoking; the loss of life occasioned by some earthquakes may be largely due to irresponsible city planners locating their creations on faults that will ultimately heave and split; and some droughts and floods may have been prevented if not for the careless way we have treated our planet. As it is the misuse of free will that has caused these evils or contributed to their occurrence, it seems best to regard them as moral evils and not natural evils. In the present work, therefore, a natural evil will be defined as an evil resulting solely or chiefly from the operation of the laws of nature. Alternatively, and perhaps more precisely, an evil will be deemed a natural evil only if no non-divine agent can be held morally responsible for its occurrence. Thus, a flood caused by human pollution of the environment will be categorized a natural evil as long as the agents involved could not be held morally responsible for the resultant evil, which would be the case if, for instance, they could not reasonably be expected to have foreseen the consequences of their behavior.

A further category of evil that has recently played an important role in discussions on the problem of evil is horrendous evil. This may be defined, following Marilyn Adams (1999: 26), as evil “the participation in which (that is, the doing or suffering of which) constitutes prima facie reason to doubt whether the participant’s life could (given their inclusion in it) be a great good to him/her on the whole." As examples of such evil, Adams lists “the rape of a woman and axing off of her arms, psycho-physical torture whose ultimate goal is the disintegration of personality, betrayal of one’s deepest loyalties, child abuse of the sort described by Ivan Karamazov, child pornography, parental incest, slow death by starvation, the explosion of nuclear bombs over populated areas” (p.26).

A horrendous evil, it may be noted, may be either a moral evil (for example, the Holocaust of 1939-45) or a natural evil (for example, the Lisbon earthquake of 1755). It is also important to note that it is the notion of a "horrendous moral evil" that comports with the current, everyday use of "evil" by English speakers. When we ordinarily employ the word "evil" today we do not intend to pick out something that is merely bad or very wrong (for example, a burglary), nor do we intend to refer to the death and destruction brought about by purely natural processes (we do not, for example, think of the 2004 Asian tsunami disaster as something that was "evil"). Instead, the word "evil" is reserved in common usage for events and people that have an especially horrific moral quality or character.

Clearly, the problem of evil is at its most difficult when stated in terms of horrendous evil (whether of the moral or natural variety), and as will be seen in Section II below, this is precisely how William Rowe’s statement of the evidential problem of evil is formulated.

Finally, these notions of good and evil indicate that the problem of evil is intimately tied to ethics. One’s underlying ethical theory may have a bearing on one’s approach to the problem of evil in at least two ways.

Firstly, one who accepts either a divine command theory of ethics or non-realism in ethics is in no position to raise the problem of evil, that is, to offer the existence of evil as at least a prima facie good reason for rejecting theism. This is because a divine command theory, in taking morality to be dependent upon the will of God, already assumes the truth of that which is in dispute, namely, the existence of God (see Brown 1967). On the other hand, non-realist ethical theories, such as moral subjectivism and error-theories of ethics, hold that there are no objectively true moral judgments. But then a non-theist who also happens to be a non-realist in ethics cannot help herself to some of the central premises found in evidential arguments from evil (such as "If there were a perfectly good God, he would want a world with no horrific evil in it"), as these purport to be objectively true moral judgments (see Nelson 1991). This is not to say, however, that atheologians such as David Hume, Bertrand Russell and J.L. Mackie, each of whom supported non-realism in ethics, were contradicting their own meta-ethics when raising arguments from evil – at least if their aim was only to show up a contradiction in the theist’s set of beliefs.

Secondly, the particular normative ethical theory one adopts (for example, consequentialism, deontology, virtue ethics) may influence the way in which one formulates or responds to an argument from evil. Indeed, some have gone so far as to claim that evidential arguments from evil usually presuppose the truth of consequentialism (see, for example, Reitan 2000). Even if this is not so, it seems that the adoption of a particular theory in normative ethics may render the problem of evil easier or harder, or at least delimit the range of solutions available. (For an excellent account of the difficulties faced by theists in relation to the problem of evil when the ethical framework is restricted to deontology, see McNaughton 1994.)

c. Versions of the Problem of Evil

The problem of evil may be described as the problem of reconciling belief in God with the existence of evil. But the problem of evil, like evil itself, has many faces. It may, for example, be expressed either as an experiential problem or as a theoretical problem. In the former case, the problem is the difficulty of adopting or maintaining an attitude of love and trust toward God when confronted by evil that is deeply perplexing and disturbing. Alvin Plantinga (1977: 63-64) provides an eloquent account of this problem:

The theist may find a religious problem in evil; in the presence of his own suffering or that of someone near to him he may find it difficult to maintain what he takes to be the proper attitude towards God. Faced with great personal suffering or misfortune, he may be tempted to rebel against God, to shake his fist in God’s face, or even to give up belief in God altogether… Such a problem calls, not for philosophical enlightenment, but for pastoral care. (emphasis in the original)

By contrast, the theoretical problem of evil is the purely "intellectual" matter of determining what impact, if any, the existence of evil has on the truth-value or the epistemic status of theistic belief. To be sure, these two problems are interconnected – theoretical considerations, for example, may color one’s actual experience of evil, as happens when suffering that is better comprehended becomes easier to bear. In this article, however, the focus will be exclusively on the theoretical dimension. This aspect of the problem of evil comes in two broad varieties: the logical problem and the evidential problem.

The logical version of the problem of evil (also known as the a priori version and the deductive version) is the problem of removing an alleged logical inconsistency between certain claims about God and certain claims about evil. J.L. Mackie (1955: 200) provides a succinct statement of this problem:

In its simplest form the problem is this: God is omnipotent; God is wholly good; and yet evil exists. There seems to be some contradiction between these three propositions, so that if any two of them were true the third would be false. But at the same time all three are essential parts of most theological positions: the theologian, it seems, at once must adhere and cannot consistently adhere to all three. (emphases in the original)

In a similar vein, H.J. McCloskey (1960: 97) frames the problem of evil as follows:

Evil is a problem for the theist in that a contradiction is involved in the fact of evil, on the one hand, and the belief in the omnipotence and perfection of God on the other. (emphasis mine)

Atheologians like Mackie and McCloskey, in maintaining that the logical problem of evil provides conclusive evidence against theism, are claiming that theists are committed to an internally inconsistent set of beliefs and hence that theism is necessarily false. More precisely, it is claimed that theists commonly accept the following propositions:

  1. God exists
  2. God is omnipotent
  3. God is omniscient
  4. God is perfectly good
  5. Evil exists.

Propositions (11)-(14) form an essential part of the orthodox conception of God, as this has been explicated in Section 1 above. But theists typically believe that the world contains evil. The charge, then, is that this commitment to (15) is somehow incompatible with the theist’s commitment to (11)-(14). Of course, (15) can be specified in a number of ways – for example, (15) may refer to the existence of any evil at all, or a certain amount of evil, or particular kinds of evil, or some perplexing distributions of evil. In each case, a different version of the logical problem of evil, and hence a distinct charge of logical incompatibility, will be generated.

The alleged incompatibility, however, is not obvious or explicit. Rather, the claim is that propositions (11)-(15) are implicitly contradictory, where a set S of propositions is implicitly contradictory if there is a necessary proposition p such that the conjunction of p with S constitutes a formally contradictory set. Those who advance logical arguments from evil must therefore add one or more necessary truths to the above set of five propositions in order to generate the fatal contradiction. By way of illustration, consider the following additional propositions that may be offered:

  1. A perfectly good being would want to prevent all evils.
  2. An omniscient being knows every way in which evils can come into existence.
  3. An omnipotent being who knows every way in which an evil can come into existence has the power to prevent that evil from coming into existence.
  4. A being who knows every way in which an evil can come into existence, who is able to prevent that evil from coming into existence, and who wants to do so, would prevent the existence of that evil.

From this set of auxiliary propositions, it clearly follows that

  1. If there exists an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good being, then no evil exists.

It is not difficult to see how the addition of (16)-(20) to (11)-(15) will yield an explicit contradiction, namely,

  1. Evil exists and evil does not exist.

If such an argument is sound, theism will not so much lack evidential support, but would rather be, as Mackie (1955: 200) puts it, “positively irrational.” For more discussion, see the article The Logical Problem of Evil.

The subject of this article, however, is the evidential version of the problem of evil (also called the a posteriori version and the inductive version), which seeks to show that the existence evil, although logically consistent with the existence of God, counts against the truth of theism. As with the logical problem, evidential formulations may be based on the sheer existence of evil, or certain instances, types, amounts, or distributions of evil. Evidential arguments from evil may also be classified according to whether they employ (i) a direct inductive approach, which aims at showing that evil counts against theism, but without comparing theism to some alternative hypothesis; or (ii) an indirect inductive approach, which attempts to show that some significant set of facts about evil counts against theism, and it does this by identifying an alternative hypothesis that explains these facts far more adequately than the theistic hypothesis. The former strategy, as will be seen in Section II, is employed by William Rowe, while the latter strategy is exemplified best in Paul Draper’s 1989 paper, “Pain and Pleasure: An Evidential Problem for Theists”. (A useful taxonomy of evidential arguments from evil can be found in Russell 1996: 194 and Peterson 1998: 23-27, 69-72.)

Evidential arguments purport to show that evil counts against theism in the sense that the existence of evil lowers the probability that God exists. The strategy here is to begin by putting aside any positive evidence we might think there is in support of theism (for example, the fine-tuning argument) as well as any negative evidence we might think there is against theism (that is, any negative evidence other than the evidence of evil). We therefore begin with a "level playing field" by setting the probability of God’s existing at 0.5 and the probability of God’s not existing at 0.5 (compare Rowe 1996: 265-66; it is worth noting, however, that this "level playing field" assumption is not entirely uncontroversial: see, for example, the objections raised by Jordan 2001 and Otte 2002: 167-68). The aim is to then determine what happens to the probability value of "God exists" once we consider the evidence generated by our observations of the various evils in our world. The central question, therefore, is: Grounds for belief in God aside, does evil render the truth of atheism more likely than the truth of theism? (A recent debate on the evidential problem of evil was couched in such terms: see Rowe 2001a: 124-25.) Proponents of evidential arguments are therefore not claiming that, even if we take into account any positive reasons there are in support of theism, the evidence of evil still manages to lower the probability of God’s existence. They are only making the weaker claim that, if we temporarily set aside such positive reasons, then it can be shown that the evils that occur in our world push the probability of God’s existence significantly downward.

But if evil counts against theism by driving down the probability value of "God exists" then evil constitutes evidence against the existence of God. Evidential arguments, therefore, claim that there are certain facts about evil that cannot be adequately explained on a theistic account of the world. Theism is thus treated as a large-scale hypothesis or explanatory theory which aims to make sense of some pertinent facts, and to the extent that it fails to do so it is disconfirmed.

In evidential arguments, however, the evidence only probabilifies its conclusion, rather than conclusively verifying it. The probabilistic nature of such arguments manifests itself in the form of a premise to the effect that "It is probably the case that some instance (or type, or amount, or pattern) of evil E is gratuitous." This probability judgment usually rests on the claim that, even after careful reflection, we can see no good reason for God’s permission of E. The inference from this claim to the judgment that there exists gratuitous evil is inductive in nature, and it is this inductive step that sets the evidential argument apart from the logical argument.

2. William Rowe’s Evidential Argument from Evil

Evidential arguments from evil seek to show that the presence of evil in the world inductively supports or makes likely the claim that God (or, more precisely, the God of orthodox theism) does not exist. A variety of evidential arguments have been formulated in recent years, but here I will concentrate on one very influential formulation, namely, that provided by William Rowe. Rowe’s version of the evidential argument has received much attention since its formal inception in 1978, for it is often considered to be the most cogent presentation of the evidential problem of evil. James Sennett (1993: 220), for example, views Rowe’s argument as “the clearest, most easily understood, and most intuitively appealing of those available.” Terry Christlieb (1992: 47), likewise, thinks of Rowe’s argument as “the strongest sort of evidential argument, the sort that has the best chance of success.” It is important to note, however, that Rowe’s thinking on the evidential problem of evil has developed in significant ways since his earliest writings on the subject, and two (if not three) distinct evidential arguments can be identified in his work. Here I will only discuss that version of Rowe’s argument that received its first full-length formulation in Rowe (1978) and, most famously, in Rowe (1979), and was successively refined in the light of criticisms in Rowe (1986), (1988), (1991), and (1995), before being abandoned in favour of a quite different evidential argument in Rowe (1996).

a. An Outline of Rowe’s Argument

In presenting his evidential argument from evil in his justly celebrated 1979 paper, “The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism”, Rowe thinks it best to focus on a particular kind of evil that is found in our world in abundance. He therefore selects “intense human and animal suffering” as this occurs on a daily basis, is in great plenitude in our world, and is a clear case of evil. More precisely, it is a case of intrinsic evil: it is bad in and of itself, even though it sometimes is part of, or leads to, some good state of affairs (Rowe 1979: 335). Rowe then proceeds to state his argument for atheism as follows:

  1. There exist instances of intense suffering which an omnipotent, omniscient being could have prevented without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse.
  2. An omniscient, wholly good being would prevent the occurrence of any intense suffering it could, unless it could not do so without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse.
  3. (Therefore) There does not exist an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly good being. (Rowe 1979: 336)

This argument, as Rowe points out, is clearly valid, and so if there are rational grounds for accepting its premises, to that extent there are rational grounds for accepting the conclusion, that is to say, atheism.

b. The Theological Premise

The second premise is sometimes called "the theological premise" as it expresses a belief about what God as a perfectly good being would do under certain circumstances. In particular, this premise states that if such a being knew of some intense suffering that was about to take place and was in a position to prevent its occurrence, then it would prevent it unless it could not do so without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse. Put otherwise, an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly good God would not permit any gratuitous evil, evil that is (roughly speaking) avoidable, pointless, or unnecessary with respect to the fulfillment of God’s purposes.

Rowe takes the theological premise to be the least controversial aspect of his argument. And the consensus seems to be that Rowe is right – the theological premise, or a version thereof that is immune from some minor infelicities in the original formulation, is usually thought to be indisputable, self-evident, necessarily true, or something of that ilk. The intuition here, as the Howard-Snyders (1999: 115) explain, is that “on the face of it, the idea that God may well permit gratuitous evil is absurd. After all, if God can get what He wants without permitting some particular horror (or anything comparably bad), why on earth would He permit it?”

An increasing number of theists, however, are beginning to question Rowe’s theological premise. This way of responding to the evidential problem of evil has been described by Rowe as “radical, if not revolutionary” (1991: 79), but it is viewed by many theists as the only way to remain faithful to the common human experience of evil, according to which utterly gratuitous evil not only exists but is abundant. In particular, some members of the currently popular movement known as open theism have rallied behind the idea that the theistic worldview is not only compatible with, but requires or demands, the possibility that there is gratuitous evil (for the movement’s "manifesto," see Pinnock et al. 1994; see also Sanders 1998, Boyd 2000, and Hasker 2004).

Although open theists accept the orthodox conception of God, as delineated in Section 1.a above, they offer a distinct account of some of the properties that are constitutive of the orthodox God. Most importantly, open theists interpret God’s omniscience in such a way that it does not include either foreknowledge (or, more specifically, knowledge of what free agents other than God will do) or middle knowledge (that is, knowledge of what every possible free creature would freely choose to do in any possible situation in which that creature might find itself). This view is usually contrasted with two other forms of orthodox theism: Molinism (named after the sixteenth-century Jesuit theologian Luis de Molina, who developed the theory of middle knowledge), according to which divine omniscience encompasses both foreknowledge and middle knowledge; and Calvinism or theological determinism, according to which God determines or predestines all that happens, thus leaving us with either no morally relevant free will at all (hard determinism) or free will of the compatibilist sort only (soft determinism).

It is often thought that the Molinist and Calvinist grant God greater providential control over the world than does the open theist. For according to the latter but not the former, the future is to some degree open-ended in that not even God can know exactly how it will turn out, given that he has created a world in which there are agents with libertarian free will and, perhaps, indeterminate natural processes. God therefore runs the risk that his creation will come to be infested with gratuitous evils, that is to say, evils he has not intended, decreed, planned for, or even permitted for the sake of some greater good. Open theists, however, argue that this risk is kept in check by God’s adoption of various general strategies by which he governs the world. God may, for example, set out to create a world in which there are creatures who have the opportunity to freely choose their destiny, but he would then ensure that adequate recompense is offered (perhaps in an afterlife) to those whose lives are ruined (through no fault of their own) by the misuse of others’ freedom (for example, a child that is raped and murdered). Nevertheless, in creating creatures with (libertarian) free will and by infusing the natural order with a degree of indeterminacy, God relinquishes exhaustive knowledge and complete control of all history. The open theist therefore encourages the rejection of what has been called "meticulous providence" (Peterson 1982: chs 4 & 5) or "the blueprint worldview" (Boyd 2003: ch.2), the view that the world was created according to a detailed divine blueprint which assigns a specific divine reason for every occurrence in history. In place of this view, the open theist presents us with a God who is a risk-taker, a God who gives up meticulous control of everything that happens, thus opening himself up to the genuine possibility of failure and disappointment – that is to say, to the possibility of gratuitous evil.

Open theism has sparked much heated debate and has been attacked from many quarters. Considered, however, as a response to Rowe’s theological premise, open theism’s prospects seem dim. The problem here, as critics have frequently pointed out, is that the open view of God tends to diminish one’s confidence in God’s ability to ensure that his purposes for an individual’s life, or for world history, will be accomplished (see, for example, Ware 2000, Ascol 2001: 176-80). The worry is that if, as open theists claim, God does not exercise sovereign control over the world and the direction of human history is open-ended, then it seems that the world is left to the mercy of Tyche or Fortuna, and we are therefore left with no assurance that God’s plan for the world and for us will succeed. Consider, for example, Eleonore Stump’s rhetorical questions, put in response to the idea of a "God of chance" advocated in van Inwagen (1988): “Could one trust such a God with one’s child, one’s life? Could one say, as the Psalmist does, "I will both lay me down in peace and sleep, for thou, Lord, only makest me dwell in safety’?” (1997: 466, quoting from Psalm 4:8). The answer may in large part depend on the degree to which the world is thought to be imbued with indeterminacy or chance.

If, for example, the open theist view introduces a high level of chance into God’s creation, this would raise the suspicion that the open view reflects an excessively deistic conception of God’s relation to the world. Deism is popularly thought of as the view that a supreme being created the world but then, like an absentee landlord, left it to run on its own accord. Deists, therefore, are often accused of postulating a remote and indifferent God, one who does not exercise providential care over his creation. Such a deity, it might be objected, resembles the open theist’s God of chance. The objection, in other words, is that open theists postulate a dark and risky universe subject to the forces of blind chance, and that it is difficult to imagine a personal God—that is, a God who seeks to be personally related to us and hence wants us to develop attitudes of love and trust towards him—providing us with such a habitat. To paraphrase Einstein, God does not play dice with our lives.

This, however, need not mean that God does not play dice at all. It is not impossible, in other words, to accommodate chance within a theistic world-view. To see this, consider a particular instance of moral evil: the rape and murder of a little girl. It seems plausible that no explanation is available as to why God would permit this specific evil (or, more precisely, why God would permit this girl to suffer then and there and in that way), since any such explanation that is offered will inevitably recapitulate the explanation offered for at least one of the major evil-kinds that subsumes the particular evil in question (for example, the class of moral evils). It is therefore unreasonable to request a reason (even a possible reason) for God’s permission of a particular event that is specific to this event and that goes beyond some general policy or plan God might have for permitting events of that kind. If this correct, then there is room for theists to accept the view that at least some evils are chancy or gratuitous in the sense that there is no specific reason as to why these evils are permitted by God. However, this kind of commitment to gratuitous evil is entirely innocuous for proponents of Rowe’s theological premise. For one can simply modify this premise so that it ranges either over particular instances of evil or (to accommodate cases where particular evils admit of no divine justification) over broadly defined evils or evil-kinds under which the relevant particular evils can be subsumed. And so a world created by God may be replete with gratuitous evil, as open theists imagine, but that need not present a problem for Rowe.

(For a different line of argument in support of the compatibility of theism and gratuitous evil, see Hasker (2004: chs 4 & 5), who argues that the consequences for morality would be disastrous if we took Rowe’s theological premise to be true. For criticisms of this view, see Rowe (1991: 79-86), Chrzan (1994), O’Connor (1998: 53-70), and Daniel and Frances Howard-Snyder (1999: 119-27).)

c. The Factual Premise

Criticisms of Rowe’s argument tend to focus on its first premise, sometimes dubbed "the factual premise," as it purports to state a fact about the world. Briefly put, the fact in question is that there exist instances of intense suffering which are gratuitous or pointless. As indicated above, an instance of suffering is gratuitous, according to Rowe, if an omnipotent, omniscient being could have prevented it without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse. A gratuitous evil, in this sense, is a state of affairs that is not (logically) necessary to the attainment of a greater good or to the prevention of an evil at least as bad.

i Rowe’s Case in Support of the Factual Premise

Rowe builds his case in support of the factual premise by appealing to particular instances of human and animal suffering, such as the following:

E1: the case of Bambi
“In some distant forest lightning strikes a dead tree, resulting in a forest fire. In the fire a fawn is trapped, horribly burned, and lies in terrible agony for several days before death relieves its suffering” (Rowe 1979: 337).

Although this is presented as a hypothetical event, Rowe takes it to be “a familiar sort of tragedy, played not infrequently on the stage of nature” (1988: 119).

E2: the case of Sue
This is an actual event in which a five-year-old girl in Flint, Michigan was severely beaten, raped and then strangled to death early on New Year’s Day in 1986. The case was introduced by Bruce Russell (1989: 123), whose account of it, drawn from a report in the Detroit Free Press of January 3 1986, runs as follows:

The girl’s mother was living with her boyfriend, another man who was unemployed, her two children, and her 9-month old infant fathered by the boyfriend. On New Year’s Eve all three adults were drinking at a bar near the woman’s home. The boyfriend had been taking drugs and drinking heavily. He was asked to leave the bar at 8:00 p.m. After several reappearances he finally stayed away for good at about 9:30 p.m. The woman and the unemployed man remained at the bar until 2:00 a.m. at which time the woman went home and the man to a party at a neighbor’s home. Perhaps out of jealousy, the boyfriend attacked the woman when she walked into the house. Her brother was there and broke up the fight by hitting the boyfriend who was passed out and slumped over a table when the brother left. Later the boyfriend attacked the woman again, and this time she knocked him unconscious. After checking the children, she went to bed. Later the woman’s 5-year old girl went downstairs to go to the bathroom. The unemployed man returned from the party at 3:45 a.m. and found the 5-year old dead. She had been raped, severely beaten over most of her body and strangled to death by the boyfriend.

Following Rowe (1988: 120), the case of the fawn will be referred to as "E1", and the case of the little girl as "E2". Further, following William Alston’s (1991: 32) practice, the fawn will be named "Bambi" and the little girl "Sue".

Rowe (1996: 264) states that, in choosing to focus on E1 and E2, he is “trying to pose a serious difficulty for the theist by picking a difficult case of natural evil, E1 (Bambi), and a difficult case of moral evil, E2 (Sue).” Rowe, then, is attempting to state the evidential argument in the strongest possible terms. As one commentator has put it, “if these cases of evil [E1 and E2] are not evidence against theism, then none are” (Christlieb 1992: 47). However, Rowe’s almost exclusive preoccupation with these two instances of suffering must be placed within the context of his belief (as expressed in, for example, 1979: 337-38) that even if we discovered that God could not have eliminated E1 and E2 without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse, it would still be unreasonable to believe this of all cases of horrendous evil occurring daily in our world. E1 and E2 are thus best viewed as representative of a particular class of evil which poses a specific problem for theistic belief. This problem is expressed by Rowe in the following way:

(P) No good state of affairs we know of is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being’s obtaining it would morally justify that being’s permitting E1 or E2. Therefore,

(Q) It is likely that no good state of affairs is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being’s obtaining it would morally justify that being in permitting E1 or E2.

P states that no good we know of justifies God in permitting E1 and E2. From this it is inferred that Q is likely to be true, or that probably there are no goods which justify God in permitting E1 and E2. Q, of course, corresponds to the factual premise of Rowe’s argument. Thus, Rowe attempts to establish the truth of the factual premise by appealing to P.

ii. The Inference from P to Q

At least one question to be addressed when considering this inference is: What exactly do P and Q assert? Beginning with P, the central notion here is "a good state of affairs we know of." But what is it to know of a good state of affairs? According to Rowe (1988: 123), to know of a good state of affairs is to (a) conceive of that state of affairs, and (b) recognize that it is intrinsically good (examples of states that are intrinsically good include pleasure, happiness, love, and the exercise of virtue). Rowe (1996: 264) therefore instructs us to not limit the set of goods we know of to goods that we know have occurred in the past or to goods that we know will occur in the future. The set of goods we know of must also include goods that we have some grasp of, even if we do not know whether they have occurred or ever will occur. For example, such a good, in the case of Sue, may consist of the experience of eternal bliss in the hereafter. Even though we lack a clear grasp of what this good involves, and even though we cannot be sure that such a good will ever obtain, we do well to include this good amongst the goods we know of. A good that we know of, however, cannot justify God in permitting E1 or E2 unless that good is actualized at some time.

On what grounds does Rowe think that P is true? Rowe (1988: 120) states that “we have good reason to believe that no good state of affairs we know of would justify an omnipotent, omniscient being in permitting either E1 or E2” (emphasis his). The good reason in question consists of the fact that the good states of affairs we know of, when reflecting on them, meet one or both of the following conditions: either an omnipotent being could obtain them without having to permit E1 or E2, or obtaining them would not morally justify that being in permitting E1 or E2 (Rowe 1988: 121, 123; 1991: 72).

This brings us, finally, to Rowe’s inference from P to Q. This is, of course, an inductive inference. Rowe does not claim to know or be able to prove that cases of intense suffering such as the fawn’s are indeed pointless. For as he acknowledges, it is quite possible that there is some familiar good outweighing the fawn’s suffering and which is connected to that suffering in a way unbeknown to us. Or there may be goods we are not aware of, to which the fawn’s suffering is intimately connected. But although we do not know or cannot establish the truth of Q, we do possess rational grounds for accepting Q, and these grounds consist of the considerations adumbrated in P. Thus, the truth of P is taken to provide strong evidence for the truth of Q (Rowe 1979: 337).

3. The Skeptical Theist Response

Theism, particularly as expressed within the Judeo-Christian and Islamic religions, has always emphasized the inscrutability of the ways of God. In Romans 11:33-34, for example, the apostle Paul exclaims: “Oh, the depth of the riches of the wisdom and knowledge of God! How unsearchable his judgments, and his paths beyond tracing out! Who has known the mind of the Lord?” (NIV). This emphasis on mystery and the epistemic distance between God and human persons is a characteristic tenet of traditional forms of theism. It is in the context of this tradition that Stephen Wykstra developed his well-known CORNEA critique of Rowe’s evidential argument. The heart of Wykstra’s critique is that, given our cognitive limitations, we are in no position to judge as improbable the statement that there are goods beyond our ken secured by God’s permission of many of the evils we find in the world. This position – sometimes labelled "skeptical theism" or "defensive skepticism" – has generated a great deal of discussion, leading some to conclude that “the inductive argument from evil is in no better shape than its late lamented deductive cousin” (Alston 1991: 61). In this Section, I will review the challenge posed by this theistic form of skepticism, beginning with the critique advanced by Wykstra.

a. Wykstra’s CORNEA Critique

In an influential paper entitled, “The Humean Obstacle to Evidential Arguments from Evil,” Stephen Wykstra raised a formidable objection to Rowe’s inference from P to Q. Wykstra’s first step was to draw attention to the following epistemic principle, which he dubbed "CORNEA" (short for "Condition Of ReasoNable Epistemic Access"):

(C) On the basis of cognized situation s, human H is entitled to claim "It appears that p" only if it is reasonable for H to believe that, given her cognitive faculties and the use she has made of them, if p were not the case, s would likely be different than it is in some way discernible by her. (Wykstra 1984: 85)

The point behind CORNEA may be easier to grasp if (C) is simplified along the following lines:

(C*) H is entitled to infer "There is no x" from "So far as I can tell, there is no x" only if:

It is reasonable for H to believe that if there were an x, it is likely that she would perceive (or find, grasp, comprehend, conceive) it.

Adopting terminology introduced by Wykstra (1996), the inference from "So far as I can tell, there is no x" to "There is no x" may be called a "noseeum inference": we no see ’um, so they ain’t there! Further, the italicized portion in (C*) may be called "the noseeum assumption," as anyone who employs a noseeum inference and is justified in doing so would be committed to this assumption.

C*, or at least something quite like it, appears unobjectionable. If, for instance, I am looking through the window of my twentieth-floor office to the garden below and I fail to see any caterpillars on the flowers, that would hardly entitle me to infer that there are in fact no caterpillars there. Likewise, if a beginner were watching Kasparov play Deep Blue, it would be unreasonable for her to infer "I can’t see any way for Deep Blue to get out of check; so, there is none." Both inferences are illegitimate for the same reason: the person making the inference does not have what it takes to discern the sorts of things in question. It is this point that C* intends to capture by insisting that a noseeum inference is permissible only if it is likely that one would detect or discern the item in question if it existed.

But how does the foregoing relate to Rowe’s evidential argument? Notice, to begin with, that Rowe’s inference from P to Q is a noseeum inference. Rowe claims in P that, so far as we can see, no goods justify God’s permission of E1 and E2, and from this he infers that no goods whatever justify God’s permission of these evils. According to Wykstra, however, Rowe is entitled to make this noseeum inference only if he is entitled to make the following noseeum assumption:

If there are goods justifying God’s permission of horrendous evil, it is likely that we would discern or be cognizant of such goods.

Call this Rowe’s Noseeum Assumption, or RNA for short. The key issue, then, is whether we should accept RNA. Many theists, led by Stephen Wykstra, have claimed that RNA is false (or that we ought to suspend judgement about its truth). They argue that the great gulf between our limited cognitive abilities and the infinite wisdom of God prevents us (at least in many cases) from discerning God’s reasons for permitting evil. On this view, even if there are goods secured by God’s permission of evil, it is likely that these goods would be beyond our ken. Alvin Plantinga (1974: 10) sums up this position well with his rhetorical question: “Why suppose that if God does have a reason for permitting evil, the theist would be the first to know?” (emphasis his). Since theists such as Wykstra and Plantinga challenge Rowe’s argument (and evidential arguments in general) by focusing on the limits of human knowledge, they have become known as skeptical theists.

I will now turn to some considerations that have been offered by skeptical theists against RNA.

b. Wykstra’s Parent Analogy

Skeptical theists have drawn various analogies in an attempt to highlight the implausibility of RNA. The most common analogy, and the one favoured by Wykstra, involves a comparison between the vision and wisdom of an omniscient being such as God and the cognitive capacities of members of the human species. Clearly, the gap between God’s intellect and ours is immense, and Wykstra (1984: 87-91) compares it to the gap between the cognitive abilities of a parent and her one-month-old infant. But if this is the case, then even if there were outweighing goods connected in the requisite way to the instances of suffering appealed to by Rowe, that we should discern most of these goods is just as likely as that a one-month-old infant should discern most of her parents’ purposes for those pains they allow her to suffer – that is to say, it is not likely at all. Assuming that CORNEA is correct, Rowe would not then be entitled to claim, for any given instance of apparently pointless suffering, that it is indeed pointless. For as the above comparison between God’s intellect and the human mind indicates, even if there were outweighing goods served by certain instances of suffering, such goods would be beyond our ken. What Rowe has failed to see, according to Wykstra, is that “if we think carefully about the sort of being theism proposes for our belief, it is entirely expectable – given what we know of our cognitive limits – that the goods by virtue of which this Being allows known suffering should very often be beyond our ken” (1984: 91).

c. Alston’s Analogies

Rowe, like many others, has responded to Wykstra’s Parent Analogy by identifying a number of relevant disanalogies between a one-month-old infant and our predicament as adult human beings (see Rowe 1996: 275). There are, however, various other analogies that skeptical theists have employed in order to cast doubt on RNA. Here I will briefly consider a series of analogies that were first formulated by Alston (1996).

Like Wykstra, Alston (1996: 317) aims to highlight “the absurdity of the claim” that the fact that we cannot see what justifying reason an omniscient, omnipotent being might have for doing something provides strong support for the supposition that no such reason is available to that being. Alston, however, chooses to steer clear of the parent-child analogy employed by Wykstra, for he concedes that this contains loopholes that can be exploited in the ways suggested by Rowe.

Alston’s analogies fall into two groups, the first of which attempt to show that the insights attainable by finite, fallible human beings are not an adequate indication of what is available by way of reasons to an omniscient, omnipotent being. Suppose I am a first-year university physics student and I am faced with a theory of quantum phenomena, but I struggle to see why the author of the theory draws the conclusions she draws. Does that entitle me to suppose that she has no sufficient reason for her conclusions? Clearly not, for my inability to discern her reasons is only to be expected given my lack of expertise in the subject. Similarly, given my lack of training in painting, I fail to see why Picasso arranged the figures in Guernica as he did. But that does not entitle me to infer that he had no sufficient reason for doing so. Again, being a beginner in chess, I fail to see any reason why Kasparov made the move he did, but I would be foolish to conclude that he had no good reason to do so.

Alston applies the foregoing to the noseeum inference from "We cannot see any sufficient reason for God to permit E1 and E2" to "God has no sufficient reason to do so." In this case, as in the above examples, we are in no position to draw such a conclusion for we lack any reason to suppose that we have a sufficient grasp of the range of possible reasons open to the other party. Our grasp of the reasons God might have for his actions is thus comparable to the grasp of the neophyte in the other cases. Indeed, Alston holds that “the extent to which God can envisage reasons for permitting a given state of affairs exceeds our ability to do so by at least as much as Einstein’s ability to discern the reason for a physical theory exceeds the ability of one ignorant of physics” (1996: 318, emphasis his).

Alston’s second group of analogies seek to show that, in looking for the reasons God might have for certain acts or omissions, we are in effect trying to determine whether there is a so-and-so in a territory the extent and composition of which is largely unknown to us (or, at least, it is a territory such that we have no way of knowing the extent to which its constituents are unknown to us). Alston thus states that Rowe’s noseeum inference

…is like going from "We haven’t found any signs of life elsewhere in the universe" to "There isn’t life elsewhere in the universe." It is like someone who is culturally and geographically isolated going from "As far as I have been able to tell, there is nothing on earth beyond this forest" to "There is nothing on earth beyond this forest." Or, to get a bit more sophisticated, it is like someone who reasons "We are unable to discern anything beyond the temporal bounds of our universe," where those bounds are the big bang and the final collapse, to "There is nothing beyond the temporal bounds of our universe." (1996: 318)

Just as we lack a map of the relevant "territory" in these cases, we also lack a reliable internal map of the diversity of considerations that are available to an omniscient being in permitting instances of suffering. But given our ignorance of the extent, variety, or constitution of the terra incognita, it is surely the better part of wisdom to refrain from drawing any hasty conclusions regarding the nature of this territory.

Although such analogies may not be open to the same criticisms levelled against the analogies put forward by Wykstra, they are in the end no more successful than Wykstra’s analogies. Beginning with Alston’s first group of analogies, where a noseeum inference is unwarranted due to a lack of expertise, there is typically no expectation on the part of the neophyte that the reasons held by the other party (for example, the physicist’s reasons for drawing conclusion x, Kasparov’s reasons for making move x in a chess game) would be discernible to her. If you have just begun to study physics, you would not expect to understand Einstein’s reasons for advancing the special theory of relativity. However, if your five-year-old daughter suffered the fate of Sue as depicted in E2, would you not expect a perfectly loving being to reveal his reasons to you for allowing this to happen, or at least to comfort you by providing you with special assurances that that there is a reason why this terrible evil could not have been prevented? Rowe makes this point quite well:

Being finite beings we can’t expect to know all the goods God would know, any more than an amateur at chess should expect to know all the reasons for a particular move that Kasparov makes in a game. But, unlike Kasparov who in a chess match has a good reason not to tell us how a particular move fits into his plan to win the game, God, if he exists, isn’t playing chess with our lives. In fact, since understanding the goods for the sake of which he permits terrible evils to befall us would itself enable us to better bear our suffering, God has a strong reason to help us understand those goods and how they require his permission of the terrible evils that befall us. (2001b: 157)

There appears, then, to be an obligation on the part of a perfect being to not keep his intentions entirely hidden from us. Such an obligation, however, does not attach to a gifted chess player or physicist – Kasparov cannot be expected to reveal his game plan, while a physics professor cannot be expected to make her mathematical demonstration in support of quantum theory comprehensible to a high school physics student.

Similarly with Alston’s second set of analogies, where our inability to map the territory within which to look for x is taken to preclude us from inferring from our inability to find x that there is no x. This may be applicable to cases like the isolated tribesman’s search for life outside his forest or our search for extraterrestrial life, for in such scenarios there is no prior expectation that the objects of our search are of such a nature that, if they exist, they would make themselves manifest to us. However, in our search for God’s reasons we are toiling in a unique territory, one inhabited by a perfectly loving being who, as such, would be expected to make at least his presence, if not also his reasons for permitting evil, (more) transparent to us. This difference in prior expectations uncovers an important disanalogy between the cases Alston considers and cases involving our attempt to discern God’s intentions. Alston’s analogies, therefore, not only fail to advance the case against RNA but also suggest a line of thought in support of RNA. (For further discussion on RNA and divine hiddenness, see Trakakis (2003); see also Howard-Snyder & Moser (2002).)

4. Building a Theodicy, or Casting Light on the Ways of God

Most critics of Rowe’s evidential argument have thought that the problem with the argument lies with its factual premise. But what, exactly, is wrong with this premise? According to one popular line of thought, the factual premise can be shown to be false by identifying goods that we know of that would justify God in permitting evil. To do this is to develop a theodicy.

a. What Is a Theodicy?

The primary aim of the project of theodicy may be characterized in John Milton’s celebrated words as the attempt to “justify the ways of God to men.” That is to say, a theodicy aims to vindicate the justice or goodness of God in the face of the evil found in the world, and this it attempts to do by offering a reasonable explanation as to why God allows evil to abound in his creation.

A theodicy may be thought of as a story told by the theist explaining why God permits evil. Such a story, however, must be plausible or reasonable in the sense that it conforms to all of the following:

  1. commonsensical views about the world (for example, that there exist other people, that there exists a mind-independent world, that much evil exists);
  2. widely accepted scientific and historical views (for example, evolutionary theory), and
  3. intuitively plausible moral principles (for example, generally, punishment should not be significantly disproportional to the offence committed).

Judged by these criteria, the story of the Fall (understood in a literalist fashion) could not be offered as a theodicy. For given the doubtful historicity of Adam and Eve, and given the problem of harmonizing the Fall with evolutionary theory, such an account of the origin of evil cannot reasonably held to be plausible. A similar point could be made about stories that attempt to explain evil as the work of Satan and his cohorts.

b. Distinguishing a "Theodicy" from a "Defence"

An important distinction is often made between a defence and a theodicy. A theodicy is intended to be a plausible or reasonable explanation as to why God permits evil. A defence, by contrast, is only intended as a possible explanation as to why God permits evil. A theodicy, moreover, is offered as a solution to the evidential problem of evil, whereas a defence is offered as a solution to the logical problem of evil. Here is an example of a defence, which may clarify this distinction:

It will be recalled that, according to Mackie, it is logically impossible for the following two propositions to be jointly true:

  1. God is omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good,
  2. Evil exists.

Now, consider the following proposition:

  1. Every person goes wrong in every possible world.

In other words, every free person created by God would misuse their free will on at least one occasion, no matter which world (or what circumstances) they were placed in. This may be highly implausible, or even downright false – but it is, at least, logically possible. And if (3) is possible, then so is the following proposition:

  1. It was not within God’s power to create a world containing moral good but no moral evil.

In other words, it is possible that any world created by God that contains some moral good will also contain some moral evil. Therefore, it is possible for both (1) and (2) to be jointly true, at least when (2) is said to refer to "moral evil." But what about "natural evil"? Well, consider the following proposition:

  1. All so-called "natural evil" is brought about by the devious activities of Satan and his cohorts.

In other words, what we call "natural evil" is actually "moral evil" since it results from the misuse of someone’s free will (in this case, the free will of some evil demon). Again, this may be highly implausible, or even downright false – but it is, at least, possibly true.

In sum, Mackie was wrong to think that it is logically impossible for both (1) and (2) to be true. For if you conjoin (4) and (5) to (1) and (2), it becomes clear that it is possible that any world created by God would have some evil in it. (This, of course, is the famous free will defence put forward in Plantinga 1974: ch.9). Notice that the central claims of this defence – namely, (3), (4), and (5) – are only held to be possibly true. That’s what makes this a defence. One could not get away with this in a theodicy, for a theodicy must be more than merely possibly true.

c. Sketch of a Theodicy

What kind of theodicy, then, can be developed in response to Rowe’s evidential argument? Are there any goods we know of that would justify God in permitting evils like E1 and E2? Here I will outline a proposal consisting of three themes that have figured prominently in the recent literature on the project of theodicy.

(1) Soul-making. Inspired by the thought of the early Church Father, Irenaeus of Lyon (c.130-c.202 CE), John Hick has put forward in a number of writings, but above all in his 1966 classic Evil and the God of Love, a theodicy that appeals to the good of soul-making (see also Hick 1968, 1977, 1981, 1990). According to Hick, the divine intention in relation to humankind is to bring forth perfect finite personal beings by means of a "vale of soul-making" in which humans may transcend their natural self-centredness by freely developing the most desirable qualities of moral character and entering into a personal relationship with their Maker. Any world, however, that makes possible such personal growth cannot be a hedonistic paradise whose inhabitants experience a maximum of pleasure and a minimum of pain. Rather, an environment that is able to produce the finest characteristics of human personality – particularly the capacity to love – must be one in which “there are obstacles to be overcome, tasks to be performed, goals to be achieved, setbacks to be endured, problems to be solved, dangers to be met” (Hick 1966: 362). A soul-making environment must, in other words, share a good deal in common with our world, for only a world containing great dangers and risks, as well as the genuine possibility of failure and tragedy, can provide opportunities for the development of virtue and character. A necessary condition, however, for this developmental process to take place is that humanity be situated at an "epistemic distance" from God. On Hick’s view, in other words, if we were initially created in the direct presence of God we could not freely come to love and worship God. So as to preserve our freedom in relation to God, the world must be created religiously ambiguous or must appear, to some extent at least, as if there were no God. And evil, of course, plays an important role in creating the desired epistemic distance.

(2) Free will. The appeal to human freedom, in one guise or another, constitutes an enduring theme in the history of theodicy. Typically, the kind of freedom that is invoked by the theodicist is the libertarian sort, according to which I am free with respect to a particular action at time t only if the action is not determined by all that happened or obtained before t and all the causal laws there are in such a way that the conjunction of the two (the past and the laws) logically entails that I perform the action in question. My mowing the lawn, for instance, constitutes a voluntary action only if, the state of the universe (including my beliefs and desires) and laws of nature being just as they were immediately preceding my decision to mow the lawn, I could have chosen or acted otherwise than I in fact did. In this sense, the acts I perform freely are genuinely "up to me" – they are not determined by anything external to my will, whether these be causal laws or even God. And so it is not open to God to cause or determine just what actions I will perform, for if he does so those actions could not be free. Freedom and determinism are incompatible.

The theodicist, however, is not so much interested in libertarian freedom as in libertarian freedom of the morally relevant kind, where this consists of the freedom to choose between good and evil courses of action. The theodicist’s freedom, moreover, is intended to be morally significant, not only providing one with the capacity to bring about good and evil, but also making possible a range of actions that vary enormously in moral worth, from great and noble deeds to horrific evils.

Armed therefore with such a conception of freedom, the free will theodicist proceeds to explain the existence of moral evil as a consequence of the misuse of our freedom. This, however, means that responsibility for the existence of moral evil lies with us, not with God. Of course, God is responsible for creating the conditions under which moral evil could come into existence. But it was not inevitable that human beings, if placed in those conditions, would go wrong. It was not necessary, in other words, that humans would misuse their free will, although this always was a possibility and hence a risk inherent in God’s creation of free creatures. The free will theodicist adds, however, that the value of free will (and the goods it makes possible) is so great as to outweigh the risk that it may be misused in various ways.

(3) Heavenly bliss. Theodicists sometimes draw on the notion of a heavenly afterlife to show that evil, particularly horrendous evil, only finds its ultimate justification or redemption in the life to come. Accounts of heaven, even within the Christian tradition, vary widely. But one common feature in these accounts that is relevant to the theodicist’s task is the experience of complete felicity for eternity brought about by intimate and loving communion with God. This good, as we saw, plays an important role in Hick’s theodicy, and it also finds a central place in Marilyn Adams’ account of horrendous evil.

Adams (1986: 262-63, 1999: 162-63) notes that, on the Christian world-view, the direct experience of "face-to-face" intimacy with God is not only the highest good we can aspire to enjoy, but is also an incommensurable good – more precisely, it is incommensurable with respect to any merely temporal evils or goods. As the apostle Paul put it, “our present sufferings are not worth comparing with the glory that will be revealed in us” (Rom 8:18, NIV; compare 2 Cor 4:17). This glorification to be experienced in heaven, according to Adams, vindicates God’s justice and love toward his creatures. For the experience of the beatific vision outweighs any evil, even evil of the horrendous variety, that someone may suffer, thus ensuring a balance of good over evil in the sufferer’s life that is overwhelmingly favourable. But as Adams points out, “strictly speaking, there will be no balance to be struck” (1986: 263, emphasis hers), since the good of the vision of God is incommensurable with respect to one’s participation in any temporal or created evils. And so an everlasting, post-mortem beatific vision of God would provide anyone who experienced it with good reason for considering their life – in spite of any horrors it may have contained – as a great good, thus removing any grounds of complaint against God.

Bringing these three themes together, a theodicy can be developed with the aim of explaining and justifying God’s permission of evil, even evil of the horrendous variety. To illustrate how this may be done, I will concentrate on Rowe’s E2 and the Holocaust, two clear instances of horrendous moral evil.

Notice that these two evils clearly involve a serious misuse of free will on behalf of the perpetrators. We could, therefore, begin by postulating God’s endowment of humans with morally significant free will as the first good that is served by these evils. That is to say, God could not prevent the terrible suffering and death endured by Sue and the millions of Holocaust victims while at the same time creating us without morally significant freedom – the freedom to do both great evil and great good. In addition, these evils may provide an opportunity for soul-making – in many cases, however, the potential for soul-making would not extend to the victim but only to those who cause or witness the suffering. The phenomenon of "jailhouse conversions," for example, testifies to the fact that even horrendous evil may occasion the moral transformation of the perpetrator. Finally, to adequately compensate the victims of these evils we may introduce the doctrine of heaven. Postmortem, the victims are ushered into a relation of beatific intimacy with God, an incommensurable good that "redeems" their past participation in horrors. For the beatific vision in the afterlife not only restores value and meaning to the victim’s life, but also provides them with the opportunity to endorse their life (taken as a whole) as worthwhile.

Does this theodicy succeed in exonerating God? Various objections could, of course, be raised against such a theodicy. One could, for example, question the intelligibility or empirical adequacy of the underlying libertarian notion of free will (see, for example, Pereboom 2001: 38-88). Or one might follow Tooley (1980:373-75) and Rowe (1996: 279-81, 2001a: 135-36) in thinking that, just as we have a duty to curtail another person’s exercise of free will when we know that they will use their free will to inflict considerable suffering on an innocent (or undeserving) person, so too does God have a duty of this sort. On this view, a perfectly good God would have intervened to prevent us from misusing our freedom to the extent that moral evil, particularly moral evil of the horrific kind, would either not occur at all or occur on a much more infrequent basis. Finally, how can the above theodicy be extended to account for natural evil? Various proposals have been offered here, the most prominent of which are: Hick’s view that natural evil plays an essential part in the "soul-making" process; Swinburne’s "free will theodicy for natural evil" – the idea, roughly put, is that free will cannot be had without the knowledge of how to bring about evil (or prevent its occurrence), and since this knowledge of how to cause evil can only be had through prior experience with natural evil, it follows that the existence of natural evil is a logically necessary condition for the exercise of free will (see Swinburne 1978, 1987: 149-67, 1991: 202-214, 1998: 176-92); and "natural law theodicies," such as that developed by Reichenbach (1976, 1982: 101-118), according to which the natural evils that befall humans and animals are the unavoidable by-products of the outworking of the natural laws governing God’s creation.

5. Further Responses to the Evidential Problem of Evil

Let’s suppose that Rowe’s evidential argument from evil succeeds in providing strong evidence in support of the claim that there does not exist an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly good being. What follows from this? In particular, would a theist who finds its impossible to fault Rowe’s argument be obliged to give up her theism? Not necessarily, for at least two further options would be available to such a theist.

Firstly, the theist may agree that Rowe’s argument provides some evidence against theism, but she may go on to argue that there is independent evidence in support of theism which outweighs the evidence against theism. In fact, if the theist thinks that the evidence in support of theism is quite strong, she may employ what Rowe (1979: 339) calls "the G.E. Moore shift" (compare Moore 1953: ch.6). This involves turning the opponent’s argument on its head, so that one begins by denying the very conclusion of the opponent’s argument. The theist’s counter-argument would then proceed as follows:

(not-3) There exists an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly good being.
(2) An omniscient, wholly good being would prevent the occurrence of any intense suffering it could, unless it could not do so without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse.
(not-1) (Therefore) It is not the case that there exist instances of horrendous evil which an omnipotent, omniscient being could have prevented without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse.

Although this strategy has been welcomed by many theists as an appropriate way of responding to evidential arguments from evil (for example, Mavrodes 1970: 95-97, Evans 1982: 138-39, Davis 1987: 86-87, Basinger 1996: 100-103) – indeed, it is considered by Rowe to be “the theist’s best response” (1979: 339) – it is deeply problematic in a way that is often overlooked. The G.E. Moore shift, when employed by the theist, will be effective only if the grounds for accepting not-(3) [the existence of the theistic God] are more compelling than the grounds for accepting not-(1) [the existence of gratuitous evil]. The problem here is that the kind of evidence that is typically invoked by theists in order to substantiate the existence of God – for example, the cosmological and design arguments, appeals to religious experience – does not even aim to establish the existence of a perfectly good being, or else, if it does have such an aim, it faces formidable difficulties in fulfilling it. But if this is so, then the theist may well be unable to offer any evidence at all in support of not-(3), or at least any evidence of a sufficiently strong or cogent nature in support of not-(3). The G.E. Moore shift, therefore, is not as straightforward a strategy as it initially seems.

Secondly, the theist who accepts Rowe’s argument may claim that Rowe has only shown that one particular version of theism – rather than every version of theism – needs to be rejected. A process theist, for example, may agree with Rowe that there is no omnipotent being, but would add that God, properly understood, is not omnipotent, or that God’s power is not as unlimited as is usually thought (see, for example, Griffin 1976, 1991). An even more radical approach would be to posit a "dark side" in God and thus deny that God is perfectly good. Theists who adopt this approach (for example, Blumenthal 1993, Roth 2001) would also have no qualms with the conclusion of Rowe’s argument.

There are at least two problems with this second strategy. Firstly, Rowe’s argument is only concerned with the God of orthodox theism as described in Section 1.a above, not the God of some other version of theism. And so objections drawn from non-orthodox forms of theism fail to engage with Rowe’s argument (although such objections may be useful in getting us to reconsider the traditional understanding of God). A second problem concerns the worship-worthiness of the sort of deity being proposed. For example, would someone who is not wholly good and capable of evil be fit to be the object of our worship, total devotion and unconditional commitment? Similarly, why place complete trust in a God who is not all-powerful and hence not in full control of the world? (To be sure, even orthodox theists will place limits on God’s power, and such limits on divine power may go some way towards explaining the presence of evil in the world. But if God’s power, or lack thereof, is offered as the solution to the problem of evil – so that the reason why God allows evil is because he doesn’t have the power to prevent it from coming into being – then we are faced with a highly impotent God who, insofar as he is aware of the limitations in his power, may be considered reckless for proceeding with creation.)

6. Conclusion

Evidential arguments from evil, such as those developed by William Rowe, purport to show that, grounds for belief in God aside, the existence of evil renders atheism more reasonable than theism. What verdict, then, can be reached regarding such arguments? A brief answer to this question may be provided by way of an overview of the foregoing investigation.

Firstly, as was argued in Section II, the "open theist" response to Rowe’s theological premise either runs the risk of diminishing confidence in God or else is entirely compatible with the theological premise. Secondly, the "sceptical theist" objection to Rowe’s inference from inscrutable evil to pointless evil was examined in Section III and was found to be inadequately supported. Thirdly, various theodical options were canvassed in Section IV as a possible way of refuting Rowe’s factual premise, and it was found that a theodicy that appeals to the goods of free will, soul-making, and a heavenly afterlife may go some way in accounting for the existence of moral evil. Such a theodicy, however, raises many further questions relating to the existence of natural evil and the existence of so much horrendous moral evil. And finally, as argued in Section V, the strategy of resorting to the "G.E. Moore shift" faces the daunting task of furnishing evidence in support of the existence of a perfect being; while resorting to a non-orthodox conception of God dissolves the problem of evil at the cost of corroding religiously significant attitudes and practices such as the love and worship of God.

On the basis of these results it can be seen that Rowe’s argument has a strongly resilient character, successfully withstanding many of the objections raised against it. Much more, of course, can be said both in support of and against Rowe’s case for atheism. Although it might therefore be premature to declare any one side to the debate victorious, it can be concluded that, at the very least, Rowe’s evidential argument is not as easy to refute as is often presumed.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. 1996. “Redemptive Suffering: A Christian Solution to the Problem of Evil,” in Robert Audi and William J. Wainwright (eds), Rationality, Religious Belief, and Moral Commitment. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp.248-67.
  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. 1999. Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God. Melbourne: Melbourne University Press.
  • Alston, William P. 1991. “The Inductive Argument from Evil and the Human Cognitive Condition,” Philosophical Perspectives 5: 29-67.
  • Alston, William P. 1996. “Some (Temporarily) Final Thoughts on the Evidential Arguments from Evil,” in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, pp.311-32.
  • Ascol, Thomas K. 2001. “Pastoral Implications of Open Theism,” in Douglas Wilson (ed.), Bound Only Once: The Failure of Open Theism. Moscow, ID: Canon Press, pp.173-90.
  • Basinger, David. 1996. The Case for Freewill Theism: A Philosophical Assessment. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Blumenthal, David R. 1993. Facing the Abusing God: A Theology of Protest. Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox Press.
  • Boyd, Gregory A. 2000. God of the Possible: A Biblical Introduction to the Open View of God. Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books.
  • Boyd, Gregory A. 2003. Is God to Blame? Moving Beyond Pat Answers to the Problem of Evil. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Brown, Patterson. 1967. “God and the Good,” Religious Studies 2: 269-76.
  • Christlieb, Terry. 1992. “Which Theisms Face an Evidential Problem of Evil?” Faith and Philosophy 9: 45-64.
  • Chrzan, Keith. 1994. “Necessary Gratuitous Evil: An Oxymoron Revisited,” Faith and Philosophy 11: 134-37.
  • Davis, Stephen T. 1987. “What Good Are Theistic Proofs?” in Louis P. Pojman (ed.), Philosophy of Religion: An Anthology. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, pp.80-88.
  • Draper, Paul. 1989. “Pain and Pleasure: An Evidential Problem for Theists,” Nous 23: 331-50.
  • Evans, C. Stephen. 1982. Philosophy of Religion: Thinking about Faith. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Griffin, David Ray. 1976. God, Power, and Evil: A Process Theodicy. Philadelphia, PA: Westminster Press.
  • Griffin, David Ray. 1991. Evil Revisited: Responses and Reconsiderations. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Hasker, William. 2004. Providence, Evil and the Openness of God. London: Routledge.
  • Hick, John. 1966. Evil and the God of Love, first edition. London: Macmillan.
  • Hick, John. 1968. “God, Evil and Mystery,” Religious Studies 3: 539-46.
  • Hick, John. 1977. Evil and the God of Love, second edition. New York: HarperCollins.
  • Hick, John. 1981. “An Irenaean Theodicy” and “Response to Critiques,” in Stephen T. Davis (ed.), Encountering Evil: Live Options in Theodicy, first edition. Edinburgh: T & T Clark, pp.39-52, 63-68.
  • Hick, John. 1990. Philosophy of Religion, fourth edition. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Hoffman, Joshua, and Gary S. Rosenkrantz. 2002. The Divine Attributes. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, and Frances Howard-Snyder. 1999. “Is Theism Compatible with Gratuitous Evil?” American Philosophical Quarterly 36: 115-29.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, and Paul K. Moser (eds). 2002. Divine Hiddenness: New Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jordan, Jeff. 2001. “Blocking Rowe’s New Evidential Argument from Evil,” Religious Studies 37: 435-49.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1955. “Evil and Omnipotence,” Mind 64: 200-212.
  • Mavrodes, George I. 1970. Belief in God: A Study in the Epistemology of Religion. New York: Random House.
  • McCloskey, H.J. 1960. “God and Evil,” Philosophical Quarterly 10: 97-114.
  • McNaughton, David. 1994. “The Problem of Evil: A Deontological Perspective,” in Alan G. Padgett (ed.), Reason and the Christian Religion: Essays in Honour of Richard Swinburne. Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp.329-51.
  • Moore, G.E. 1953. Some Main Problems of Philosophy. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Morris, Thomas V. 1987. Anselmian Explorations: Essays in Philosophical Theology. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Morris, Thomas V. 1991. Our Idea of God: An Introduction to Philosophical Theology. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Nelson, Mark T. 1991. “Naturalistic Ethics and the Argument from Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 8: 368-79.
  • O’Connor, David. 1998. God and Inscrutable Evil: In Defense of Theism and Atheism. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Otte, Richard. 2002. “Rowe’s Probabilistic Argument from Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 19: 147-71.
  • Pereboom, Derk. 2001. Living Without Free Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Peterson, Michael L. 1982. Evil and the Christian God. Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Book House.
  • Peterson, Michael L. 1998. God and Evil: An Introduction to the Issues. Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
  • Pinnock, Clark H., Richard Rice, John Sanders, William Hasker, and David Basinger. 1994. The Openness of God: A Biblical Challenge to the Traditional Understanding of God. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1974. The Nature of Necessity. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1977. God, Freedom, and Evil. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Quinn, Philip L., and Charles Taliaferro (eds). 1997. A Companion to Philosophy of Religion. Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.
  • Reichenbach, Bruce R. 1976. “Natural Evils and Natural Law: A Theodicy for Natural Evils,” International Philosophical Quarterly 16: 179-96.
  • Reichenbach, Bruce R. 1982. Evil and a Good God. New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Reitan, Eric. 2000. “Does the Argument from Evil Assume a Consequentialist Morality?” Faith and Philosophy 17: 306-19.
  • Rogers, Katherin A. 2000. Perfect Being Theology. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Roth, John K. 2001. “A Theodicy of Protest”, in Stephen T. Davis (ed.), Encountering Evil: Live Options in Theodicy, second edition. Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox Press, pp.1-20.
  • Rowe, William L. 1978. Philosophy of Religion: An Introduction, first edition. Encino, CA: Dickenson Publishing Company..
  • Rowe, William L. 1979. “The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism,” American Philosophical Quarterly 16: 335-41.
  • Rowe, William L. 1986. “The Empirical Argument from Evil,” in Audi and Wainwright (eds), Rationality, Religious Belief, and Moral Commitment, pp.227-47.
  • Rowe, William L. 1988. “Evil and Theodicy,” Philosophical Topics 16: 119-32.
  • Rowe, William L. 1991. “Ruminations about Evil,” Philosophical Perspectives 5: 69-88.
  • Rowe, William L. 1995. “William Alston on the Problem of Evil,” in Thomas D. Senor (ed.), The Rationality of Belief and the Plurality of Faith: Essays in Honor of William P. Alston. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp.71-93.
  • Rowe, William L. 1996. “The Evidential Argument from Evil: A Second Look,” in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil, pp.262-85.
  • Rowe, William L. 2001a. “Grounds for Belief Aside, Does Evil Make Atheism More Reasonable than Theism” in William Rowe (ed.), God and the Problem of Evil. Malden, MA: Blackwell, pp.124-37.
  • Rowe, William L. 2001b. “Reply to Howard-Snyder and Bergmann,” in Rowe (ed.), God and the Problem of Evil, pp.155-58.
  • Russell, Bruce. 1989. “The Persistent Problem of Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 6: 121-39.
  • Russell, Bruce. 1996. “Defenseless,” in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil, pp.193-205.
  • Sanders, John. 1998. The God Who Risks: A Theology of Providence. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Sennett, James F. 1993. “The Inscrutable Evil Defense Against the Inductive Argument from Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 10: 220-29.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 1997. “Review of Peter van Inwagen, God, Knowledge, and Mystery,” Philosophical Review 106: 464-67.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1977. The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1978. “Natural Evil,” American Philosophical Quarterly 15: 295-301.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1987. “Knowledge from Experience, and the Problem of Evil,” in William J. Abraham and Steven W. Holtzer (eds), The Rationality of Religious Belief: Essays in Honour of Basil Mitchell. Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp.141-67.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1991. The Existence of God, revised edition. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1998. Providence and the Problem of Evil. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Tooley, Michael. 1980. “Alvin Plantinga and the Argument from Evil,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 58: 360-76.
  • Trakakis, Nick. 2003. “What No Eye Has Seen: The Skeptical Theist Response to Rowe’s Evidential Argument from Evil,” Philo 6: 263-79.
  • Van Inwagen, Peter. 1988. “The Place of Chance in a World Sustained by God,” in Thomas V. Morris (ed.), Divine and Human Action. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp.211-35.
  • Ware, Bruce. 2000. God’s Lesser Glory: The Diminished God of Open Theism. Wheaton, IL: Crossways Books.
  • Wykstra, Stephen J. 1984. “The Humean Obstacle to Evidential Arguments from Suffering: On Avoiding the Evils of 'Appearance',” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 16: 73-93.
  • Wykstra, Stephen J. 1986. “Rowe’s Noseeum Arguments from Evil,” in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil, pp.126-50.

Author Information

Nick Trakakis
Australian Catholic University

Philosophy of Religion

Philosophy of religion is the philosophical study of the meaning and nature of religion. It includes the analyses of religious concepts, beliefs, terms, arguments, and practices of religious adherents. The scope of much of the work done in philosophy of religion has been limited to the various theistic religions. More recent work often involves a broader, more global approach, taking into consideration both theistic and non-theistic religious traditions. The range of those engaged in the field of philosophy of religion is broad and diverse and includes philosophers from the analytic and continental traditions, Eastern and Western thinkers, religious believers and agnostics, skeptics and atheists. Philosophy of religion draws on all of the major areas of philosophy as well as other relevant fields, including theology, history, sociology, psychology, and the natural sciences.

There are a number of themes that fall under the domain of philosophy of religion as it is commonly practiced in academic departments in North America and Europe. The focus here will be limited to six: (1) religious language and belief, (2) religious diversity, (3) concepts of God / Ultimate Reality, (4) arguments for and against the existence of God, (5) problems of evil and suffering, and (6) miracles.

Table of Contents

  1. Religious Language and Belief
    1. Logical Positivism
    2. Realism and Non-realism
  2. Religious Diversity
    1. Religious Pluralism
    2. Religious Relativism
    3. Religious Exclusivism
  3. Concepts of God/Ultimate Reality
  4. Arguments for and against the Existence of God
    1. Ontological Arguments
    2. Cosmological Arguments
    3. Teleological Arguments
    4. The Challenge of Science
    5. The Coherence of Theism
  5. Problems of Evil and Suffering
    1. Logical Problems
    2. Evidential Problems
    3. Theodicy
    4. The Hiddenness of God
    5. Karma and Reincarnation
  6. Miracles
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Religious Language and Belief

a. Logical Positivism

The practice of philosophy, especially in the analytic tradition, places emphasis on precision of terms and clarity of concepts and ideas. Religious language is often vague, imprecise, and couched in mystery. In the twentieth century this linguistic imprecision was challenged by philosophers who used a principle of verifiability to reject as meaningless all non-empirical claims. For these logical positivists, only the tautologies of mathematics and logic, along with statements containing empirical observations or inferences, were taken to be meaningful. Many religious statements, including those about God, are neither tautological nor empirically verifiable. So a number of religious claims, such as “Yahweh is compassionate” or “Atman is Brahman,” were considered by the positivists to be cognitively meaningless. When logical positivism became prominent mid-century, philosophy of religion as a discipline became suspect.

By the latter half of the twentieth century, however, many philosophers came to the conclusion that the positivists’ radical empiricist claims and verificationist criteria of meaning were problematic or self-refuting. This development, along with other factors including the philosophical insights on the nature and meaning of language offered by Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889–1951) and the rise of a pragmatic version of naturalism offered by W. V. O. Quine (1908–2000), caused logical positivism to wane. By the 1970s verificationism virtually collapsed, and philosophical views that had been suppressed, including those having to do with religion and religious language, were once again fair game for philosophical discourse. With the work of certain analytic philosophers of religion, including Basil Mitchell (1917–2011), H. H. Farmer (1892–1981), Alvin Plantinga (1932–), Richard Swinburne (1934–), and John Hick (1922–), religious language and concepts were revived and soon became accepted arenas of viable philosophical and religious discourse and debate.

b. Realism and Non-realism

After the collapse of positivism, two streams emerged in philosophy of religion regarding what religious language and beliefs are about: realism and non-realism. The vast majority of religious adherents are religious realists. Realists, as used in this context, are those who hold that their religious beliefs are about what actually exists, independent of the persons who hold those beliefs. Assertions about Allah or Brahman, angels or demons, resurrection or reincarnation, for example, are true because, in part,  there are actual referents for the words “Allah,” “Brahaman,” and so forth. The implication is that statements about them can and do provide correct predications of the behavior of Allah and Brahman and so forth. If Allah or Brahman do not actually exist, assertions about them would be false. Non-realists are those who hold that religious claims are not about realities that transcend human language, concepts, and social forms; religious claims are not about realities “out there”; they are not about objectively existing entities. Religion is a human construct and religious language refers to human behavior and experience.

An important figure who had much influence on the development of religious non-realism was Ludwig Wittgenstein. In his later works, Wittgenstein understood language to be not a fixed structure directly corresponding to the way things actually are, but rather a human activity susceptible to the vicissitudes of human life and practice. Language does not provide a picture of reality, he argued, but rather presents a set of activities which he dubbed “language games.” In learning language, one needs to be able to respond to words in various contexts; speech and action work together. In many cases, then, the meaning of a word is its use in the language. For Wittgenstein, this is true in all forms of discourse, including religious discourse. In speaking of God or other religious terms or concepts, their meanings have more to do with their use than with their denotation. The language games of the religions reflect the practices and forms of life of the various religious adherents; religious statements should not be taken as providing literal descriptions of a reality that somehow lies beyond those activities.

Some non-realists have been highly critical of religion, such as Sigmund Freud (1856–1939). Others, such as Don Cupitt (1934–), have sought to transform religion. Cupitt, a philosopher, theologian, and former priest in the Church of England, rejects historic religious dogma for, he maintains, it encompasses an outdated realist metaphysics and cosmology. He also abandons the notion of objective and eternal truth and replaces it with truth as a human improvisation. His approach to religion is to translate dogma and doctrine into a spirituality of practice where they become guiding myths to live by in this life, and they lead the believer to give up belief in a supernatural afterlife beyond the grave.

Non-realists have noted the alleged failure of realism to provide evidences or justifications for the truths of any particular religion, or of religion in general, and argue that projects in natural theology—the attempt to demonstrate the existence of God from evidence found in the natural world—are abject failures. Another point made by non-realists is that, since religious claims and practices are always done within a particular human context, and since the mind structures all perception within that context, the meanings of these claims are determined and limited by that context. To affirm a transcendent realm is to go beyond these contexts and structures.

Various responses to these claims have been offered by religious realists. Regarding the claim that there is no rational justification for religious beliefs, some realists agree. Nevertheless, these fideists claim that religion does not require evidence and justification; religion is about faith and trust, not evidence. Other realists, sometimes referred to as evidentialists, disagree and claim that while faith is fundamental to religion, or at least to some religions, there are in fact good arguments and evidences for religious truth claims. Yet another group of realists are commonly referred to as “Reformed epistemologists” (the term “Reformed” refers to the Christian, Calvinist Reformation theological tradition). Three of its leading proponents are Alvin Plantinga (1932–), Nicholas Wolterstorff (1932–), and William Alston (1921–). Reformed epistemology is non-evidentialist as it asserts that evidence (in the sense that evidentialists use the term) is not required in order for one’s faith to be justified. Unlike fideism, though, its adherents maintain that belief in God can be a rational endeavor despite a lack of evidence. This is contrary to the evidentialist approach in which it is irrational to believe a claim without evidence. It is also unlike evidentialism in that its adherents are generally opposed to classical foundationalism—the view that all justified beliefs must either be properly basic or derivative of properly basic beliefs.

Regarding the claim that religious statements, concepts, and beliefs exist only within a given social context, some realists have responded by noting that, while much of what occurs in religious discourse and practice is of human origin, one need not affirm a reductionist stance in which all religious meanings and symbols are reducible to human constructs.

2. Religious Diversity

In the West, most work done in philosophy of religion historically has been theistic. More recently, there has been a growing interest in religions and religious themes beyond the scope of theism. While awareness of religious diversity is not a new phenomenon, philosophers of religion from both the East and the West are becoming increasingly more aware of and interactive with religious others. It is now common to see contributions in Western philosophy of religion literature on various traditions, including Hinduism, Buddhism, Daoism, Confucianism, and African religions.

While interest in Eastern religion and comparative religion have brought about a deeper understanding of and appreciation for the different non-theistic religious traditions, it has also brought to the fore an awareness of the many ways the different traditions conflict. Consider some examples: for Buddhists there is no creator God, whereas Muslims affirm that the universe was created by the one true God, Allah; for Advaita Vedanta Hindus, the concept of Ultimate Reality is pantheistic monism in which only Brahman exists, whereas Christians affirm theistic dualism in which God exists as distinct from human beings and the other created entities; for Muslims and Christians, salvation is the ultimate goal whereby human beings are united with God forever in the afterlife, while the Buddhists’ ultimate goal is nirvana—an extinguishing of the individual self and complete extinction of all suffering. Many other examples could be cited as well. For the realist, at least, not all of these claims can be true. How is one to respond to this diversity of fundamental beliefs?

a. Religious Pluralism

One response to religious diversity is to deny or minimize the doctrinal conflicts and to maintain that doctrine itself is not as important for religion as religious experience and that the great religious traditions are equally authentic responses to Ultimate Reality. This is one form of religious pluralism. Its most ardent defender has been John Hick. Utilizing Immanuel Kant’s (1724–1804) distinctions of noumena (things as they are in themselves) and phenomena (things as they are experienced), Hick argues that a person’s experiences, religious and non-religious, depend on the interpretive frameworks and concepts through which one’s mind structures and comprehends them. While some people experience and comprehend Ultimate Reality in personal, theistic categories (as Allah or Yahweh, to mention two), others do so in impersonal, pantheistic ways (as nirguna Brahman, for example). Yet others experience and comprehend Ultimate Reality as non-personal and non-pantheistic (as Nirvana or the Tao). We do not know which view is ultimately correct (if any of them are, and for Hick Ultimate Reality is far beyond human conceptions) since we do not have a “God’s eye” perspective by which to make such an assessment. One common illustration of the pluralist position of experiencing God is the Hindu parable of the blind men and the elephant. In this parable, God is like an elephant surrounded by several blind men. One man felt the elephant’s tail and believed it to be a rope. Another felt his trunk and believed it to be a snake. Another felt his leg and believed it to be a tree. Yet another felt his side and believed it to be a wall. Each of them experience the same elephant but in very different ways from the others. In our experiences and understandings of Ultimate Reality, we are very much like the blind men, argue such religious pluralists, for our beliefs and viewpoints are constricted by our enculturated concepts.

Hick argues for what he calls the “pluralistic hypothesis”: that Ultimate Reality is ineffable and beyond our understanding but that its presence can be experienced through various spiritual practices and linguistic systems offered within the religions. The great world religions, then, constitute very different but equally valid ways of conceiving, experiencing, and responding to Ultimate Reality. He uses different analogies to describe his hypothesis, including an ambiguous picture of a duck-rabbit. A culture that has ducks but no familiarity with rabbits would see the ambiguous diagram as a duck. People in this culture would not even be aware of the ambiguity. So too with the culture that has rabbits but no familiarity with ducks. People in this culture would see the diagram as a rabbit. Hick’s point is that the ineffable is experienced in the different traditions as Vishnu, or as Allah, or as Yahweh, or as the Tao, and so on, depending on one’s individual and cultural concepts.

One objection to pluralism of this sort is that it leads to a dilemma, neither horn of which pluralists will want to affirm. On the one hand, if we do not have concepts that are in fact referring to Ultimate Reality as it is in itself, then we have landed in religious skepticism. On the other hand, if we do have concepts that describe actual properties of Ultimate Reality, then we are not epistemically blind after all, and therefore we could, theoretically at least, be in a position to make evaluations about different claims that are made about Ultimate Reality from the various religious traditions.

Another version of religious pluralism attempts to avoid some of the difficulties of the pluralistic hypothesis. For the aspectual pluralist, there is an objective Ultimate Reality which can be knowable to us. Unlike the pluralistic hypothesis, and in very non-Kantian fashion, valid descriptions of the noumenal are possible. Peter Byrne argues that each of the different major religious traditions reflects some aspect of the transcendent. Byrne uses the notion of natural kinds in order to clarify his view. Just as the natural kind gold has an unobservable essence as well as observable properties or qualities—being yellow, lustrous, and hard—so too Ultimate Reality has an essence with different experienced manifestations. Ultimate Reality manifests different aspects of itself in the different religions given their own unique conceptual schemes and practices.

One challenge to this form of pluralism is that, since each of the religions is capturing only an aspect of the transcendent, it seems that one would obtain a better understanding of its essence by creating a new syncretistic religion in order to glean a more comprehensive understanding of Ultimate Reality. Also, since religious adherents are only glimpsing the transcendent through properties which are themselves enculturated within the various traditions, descriptions of Ultimate Reality cannot offer adequate knowledge claims about it. So one is left with at least a mitigated form of religious skepticism.

b. Religious Relativism

A second way of responding to the conflicting claims of the different traditions is to remain committed to the truth of one set of religious teachings while at the same time agreeing with some of the central concerns raised by pluralism. Religious relativism provides such a response. For religious relativism, as articulated by Joseph Runzo, the correctness of a religion is relative to the worldview of its community of adherents. On this view, each of the religious traditions are comprised of various experiences and mutually incompatible truth claims, and the traditions are themselves rooted in distinct worldviews that are incompatible with, if not contradictory to, the other worldviews. Runzo maintains that these differing experiences and traditions emerge from the plurality of phenomenal realities experienced by the adherents of the traditions. On this relativistic view, one’s worldview—that is, one’s total cognitive web of interrelated concepts and beliefs—determines how one comprehends and experiences Ultimate Reality. Furthermore, there are incompatible yet adequate truth claims that correspond to the various worldviews, and the veracity of a religion is determined by its adequacy to appropriately correspond to the worldview within which it is subsumed. An important difference between the religious relativist and the pluralist is that, for the relativist and not the pluralist, truth itself is understood to be relative.

Relativism may offer a more coherent account of religious conflict than pluralism, but it can be argued that it falls short of the actual beliefs of religious adherents. For most religious adherents, their beliefs are generally understood to be true in an objective sense. This leads to the third, and most commonly held, response to conflicting religious claims.

c. Religious Exclusivism

In contrast to pluralism and relativism is a third response to the conflicting truth claims of the religions: exclusivism. The term is used in different ways in religious discourse, but a common element is that the central tenets of one religion are true, and claims which are incompatible with those tenets are false. Another common and related element is that salvation is found exclusively in one religion. Regarding the truth claim, for example, for a Muslim exclusivist, Allah is the one true God who literally spoke to the prophet Muhammad in space and time. Since that is true, then the Advaita Vedantan claim that Brahman (God) is nirguna—without attributes—must be false, for these two understandings of Ultimate Reality contradict one another. The same is the case for all religious exclusivists; since they take their religious claims to be objectively true, the contrary claims of other religions are false. This does not mean that exclusivists are not self-critical of their own beliefs, nor does it rule out the practice of dialoguing with or learning from religious others. But it does mean that religious differences are real and that there are intractable disagreements among religious traditions. Religious exclusivism (of which Alvin Plantinga is one prominent example) has been the most widely held position among the adherents of the major world religions.

Various responses have been made to exclusivism, including moral objections (such as that the exclusivist is arrogant, dishonest, oppressive) and intellectual and epistemic objections (including claims that the exclusivist holds unjustified or irrational beliefs).

3. Concepts of God/Ultimate Reality

A major theme among philosophers of religion in the West has been that of God, including questions about the nature and existence of God, challenges to the existence of God, language about God, and so on. Within every major religion is a belief about a transcendent reality underlying the natural, physical world. From its beginnings, philosophy of religion has been concerned with reflecting on, as far as possible, how religions might understand Ultimate Reality. How the various religions conceptualize that reality differs, especially between Eastern and Western religions. In Western religion, primarily the three religions of Abrahamic descent—Judaism, Christianity, and Islam—Ultimate Reality is conceived of and described in terms of a personal God who is creator and sustainer of all and perfect in every respect. Many other properties are commonly attributed to God as well, including omniscience, omnipotence, and immutability.

In much of Eastern religion, including Buddhism, Taoism, and the Advaita Vedanta school of Hinduism, Ultimate Reality is understood quite differently. It is not a personal creator God, but an absolute state of being. It cannot be described by a set of attributes, such as omniscience or omnipotence, for it is undifferentiated Absolute Reality. Taoists refer to it as the Tao; Hindus refer to it as Brahman; for Buddhists, the name varies and includes Shunyata and Nirvana. These different conceptions of Ultimate Reality bring with them distinct understandings of other significant issues as well, such as salvation/liberation, life after death, and evil and suffering, among others.

There is a recent view of Ultimate Reality articulated by philosopher of religion John Schellenberg that he has dubbed “ultimism,” which is neither theistic nor pantheistic. According to this view, the best one can do from a religious perspective is to have faith that there exists a metaphysically and axiologically ultimate reality and that from this reality an ultimate good can be attained.

4. Arguments for and against the Existence of God

It is generally the case that religious adherents do not hold their religious convictions because of well-articulated reasons or arguments which support those convictions. However, reasons and arguments are sometimes used by believers to defend and advance their positions. Arguments for the existence of God have been utilized in natural theology and theistic apologetics for at least two millennia. Three which have been prominent historically and still receive special attention in contemporary philosophy of religion discussions are the ontological, cosmological, and teleological arguments.

a. Ontological Arguments

First developed by Saint Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109), ontological arguments take various forms. They are unique among traditional arguments for God’s existence in that they are a priori arguments, for they are based on premises that can allegedly be known independently of experience of the world. All of them begin with the concept of God and conclude that God must exist. If successful, ontological arguments prove that God’s non-existence is impossible.

Anselm argues that God is a being than which none greater can be conceived. It is one thing to exist in the mind (in the understanding) and another to exist outside the understanding (outside one’s thoughts; in reality). He then asks which is greater: to exist in the mind or in reality. His argument concludes this way:

Therefore, if that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, exists in the understanding alone, the very being, than which nothing greater can be con­ceived, is one, than which a greater can be conceived. But obviously this is impossible. Hence, there is no doubt that there exists a being, than which nothing greater can be conceived, and it exists both in the understanding and in reality. (Proslogion, chapter II, 54)

Since it would be a contradiction to affirm that the greatest possible being does not exist in reality but only in the mind (because existing in reality is greater than existing in the mind), one is logically drawn to the conclusion that God must exist.

There have been many objections to this argument. One of the most well-known is based on the analogy of the greatest possible island and was developed by Anselm’s fellow monk, Gaunilo. Utilizing a reductio ad absurdum, he argued that if we affirm Anselm’s conclusion, we must also affirm that the greatest possible island exists. Since that conclusion is absurd, so too is Anselm’s. Another important objection offered by Immanuel Kant was that existence is not a real predicate. Since existence does not add to the concept of a thing, and in Anselm’s argument existence is treated as a real predicate (rather than, say, as a quantifier), the argument is flawed.

Recent modal versions of the argument have been construed that avoid the objections to Anselm’s original formulation. Alvin Plantinga, for example, has devised a version of the ontological argument utilizing the semantics of modal logic: possibility, necessity, and possible worlds (a possible world being a world that is logically possible). Defining a maximally excellent being as one that is omniscient, omnipotent, and morally perfect in every possible world, his argument can be stated this way:

(1)   It is possible that a being exists which is maximally great (a being that we can call God).

(2)   So there is a possible world in which a maximally great being exists.

(3)   A maximally great being is necessarily maximally excellent in every possible world (by definition).

(4)   Since a maximally great being is necessarily maximally excellent in every possible world, that being is necessarily maximally excellent in the actual world.

(5)   Therefore, a maximally great being (for example, God) exists in the actual world.

Plantinga does not affirm that the argument provides conclusive proof that God exists, but he does claim that there is nothing irrational in accepting it.

Many objections have been raised against Plantinga’s modal ontological argument, including problems with possible worlds semantics, that God’s existence is a logical or metaphysical impossibility, and that it leads to metaphysical absurdities. Regarding the latter, Michael Martin (1932–), offers the following reductio:

(1’) It is possible that a special fairy exists.

(2’) So there is a possible world in which a special fairy exists.

(3’) A special fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with magical powers in

every possible world (by definition).

(4’) Since a special fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with magical powers

in every possible world, that fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with

magical powers in the actual world.

(5’) Therefore, a special fairy exists in the actual world.

Martin then argues that premise (1’) is no more contrary to reason than premise (1), so if we affirm (1) and conclude that (5), we must also affirm (1’) and conclude that (5’). Given this argument structure, we could also conclude that ghosts, gremlins, and countless other mythical creatures exist as well, which is absurd.

b. Cosmological Arguments

Cosmological arguments begin by examining some empirical or metaphysical fact of the universe, from which it then follows that something outside the universe must have caused it to exist. There are different types of cosmological arguments, and its defenders include some of the most prominent thinkers spanning the history of philosophy, including Plato, Aristotle, ibn Sina, al-Ghazali, Maimonides, Aquinas, Descartes, and Leibniz. Three versions of the argument that have received much attention are the Thomistic contingency argument, the Leibnizian sufficient reason argument, and the kalam argument.

With the Thomistic contingency argument, named after the medieval Christian theologian/philosopher Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274), the claim is made that contingent things exist in the world—“contingent things” ostensibly referring to those entities which begin to exist and cease to exist and whose existence is dependent on another. It is next argued that not all things can be contingent, for if they were there would be nothing to ground their existence. Only a necessary thing (or being) can account for the existence of contingent things—“necessary thing” ostensibly referring to a thing which never began to exist and which cannot cease to exist and whose existence does not depend on another. This necessary thing (or being) is God.

Another type of cosmological argument is the Leibnizian sufficient reason argument, so named after the German thinker Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716). With this argument, an answer is sought to the question “Why is there something rather than nothing?” For Leibniz, there must be an explanation, or “sufficient reason,” for anything that exists, and the explanation for whatever exists must lie either in the necessity of its own nature or in a cause external to itself. The argument concludes that the explanation of the universe must lie in a transcendent God since the universe does not have within its own nature the necessity of existence and God does.

Some recent versions of the cosmological argument grant that contingent things exist due to the causal events of other contingent things, but they then go on to inquire why the universe should exist at all when conceivably this could have not been the case. Utilizing elements of both Aquinas’s and Leibniz’s arguments, the central point of these recent versions is that with respect to anything that exists, there is a reason for its existence. What provides a sufficient reason for the existence of the universe? It cannot be another contingent thing (and on into infinity), for to explain the existence of any contingent thing by another contingent thing lacks a sufficient reason why any contingent thing exists. Timothy O’Connor argues this way:

If our universe truly is contingent, the obtaining of certain fundamental facts or other will be unexplained within empirical theory, whatever the topological structure of contingent reality. An infinite regress of beings in or outside the spatiotemporal universe cannot forestall such a result. If there is to be an ultimate, or complete, explanation, it will have to ground in some way the most fundamental, contingent facts of the universe in a necessary being, something which has the reason for its existence within its own nature. It bears emphasis that such an unconditional explanation need not in any way compete with conditional, empirical explanations. Indeed, it is natural to suppose that empirical explanations will be subsumed within the larger structure of the complete explanation. (Theism and Ultimate Explanation: The Necessary Shape of Contingency. Oxford, Blackwell, 2008, 76)

An objection raised against both the Thomistic- and the Leibnizian-type arguments is that they are demanding explanations which are unwarranted. If for every individual contingent thing in the universe there is an explanation, why does the whole need a further explanation? Furthermore, an explanation must at some point come to an end—a brute fact. So why not end with the universe? Why posit some further transcendent reality?

Another form of cosmological argument is commonly referred to as the kalam argument (the term “kalam” is from medieval Islamic theology and came to mean “speculative theology”). The argument is structured by William Lane Craig, its most ardent proponent in recent times, as follows:


/                  \

beginning                        no beginning

/                   \

caused                       not caused

/           \

personal                 not personal

The dilemmas are obvious. Either the universe had a beginning or it did not. If it did, either that beginning was caused or it was not caused. If it was caused, either the cause was personal or it was impersonal. Based on these dilemmas, the argument can be put in the following logical form:

  1. Whatever begins to exist has a cause of its existence.
  2. The universe began to exist.
  3. Therefore, the universe has some kind of cause of its existence.
  4. The cause of the universe is either an impersonal cause or a personal one.
  5. The cause of the universe is not impersonal.
  6. Therefore, the cause of the universe is a personal one, which we call God.

This version of the cosmological argument was bolstered by work in astrophysics and cosmology in the late twentieth century. On one interpretation of the standard Big Bang cosmological model, the time-space universe sprang into existence ex nihilo approximately 13.7 billion years ago. Such a beginning is best explained, argue kalam defenders, by a non-temporal, non-spatial, personal, transcendent cause—namely God.

The claim that the universe began to exist is also argued philosophically in at least two ways. First, it is argued that an actual infinite set of events cannot exist, for actual infinities lead to metaphysical absurdities. Since an infinite temporal regress of events is an actual infinite set of events, such a regress is metaphysically impossible. So the past cannot be infinite; the universe must have had a temporal beginning. A second approach begins by arguing that an infinite series of events cannot be formed by successive addition (one member being added to another). The reason why is that, when adding finite numbers one after the other, the set of numbers will always be finite. The addition of yet another finite number, ad infinitum, will never lead to an actual infinite. Since the past is a series of temporal events formed by successive addition, the past could not be actually infinite in duration. Nor will the future be so. The universe must have had a beginning.

Many objections have been raised against the kalam argument, both scientific and philosophical, including that there are other cosmological models of the universe besides the Big Bang in which the universe is understood to be eternal, such as various multi-verse theories. Philosophical rebuttals marshaled against the kalam argument include the utilization of set theory and mathematical systems which employ actual infinite sets.

c. Teleological Arguments

Teleological arguments in the East go back as far as 100 C.E., where the Nyāya school in India argued for the existence of a deity based on the order found in nature. In the West, Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics offered arguments for a directing intelligence of the world given the order found within it. There is an assortment of teleological arguments, but a common theme among them is the claim that certain characteristics of the natural world reflect design, purpose, and intelligence. These features of the natural world are then used as evidence for an intelligent, intentional designer of the world.

The teleological argument has been articulated and defended at various times and places throughout history, but its zenith was in the early nineteenth century with perhaps its most ardent defender: William Paley (1743–1805). In his book, Natural Theology, Paley offers an argument from analogy: since we infer a designer of an artifact such as a watch, given its evident purpose, ordered structure, and complexity, so too we should infer a grand designer of the works of nature, since they are even greater in terms of their evident purpose, order, and complexity—what he describes as “means ordered to ends.” Paley’s argument can be structured this way:

  1. Artifacts (such as a watch), with their means to ends configurations, are the products of (human) design.
  2. The works of nature, such as the human hand, resemble artifacts.
  3. Thus the works of nature are probably the products of design.
  4. Furthermore, the works of nature are much more in number and far greater in complexity.
  5. Therefore, the works of nature were probably the products of a grand designer—one much more powerful and intelligent than a human designer.

A number of objections have been raised against Paley’s version of the design argument. Those offered by David Hume (1711–1776) in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion are often taken to be archetype refutations of traditional design arguments. Among them are that the analogy between the works of nature and human artifacts is not particularly strong; that even if we could infer a grand designer of the universe, this designer turns out to be something less than the God of the theistic religions (especially given the great amount of evil in the world); and that just because a universe has the appearance of design, it does not follow that it is in fact designed; such an event could have occurred through natural, chance events.

A more recent version of the design argument is based on the apparent fine-tuning of the cosmos. Fine-tuning arguments, whose current leading defender is Robin Collins, include the claims that the laws of nature, the constants of physics, and the initial conditions of the universe are finely tuned for conscious life. Often cited as evidence are several dozen “cosmic constants” whose parameters are such that if they were altered even slightly, conscious life would be impossible. Consider the following three: (1) If the strong nuclear force (the force that binds protons and neutrons in an atom) had been either stronger or weaker by five percent, life would be impossible; (2) If neutrons were not roughly 1.001 times the mass of protons, all protons would have decayed into neutrons, or vice versa, and life would be impossible; (3) If gravity had been stronger or weaker by one part in 1040, life-sustaining stars, including the sun, could not exist; thus life would most likely be impossible. While each of the individual calculations of such constants may not be fully accurate, it is argued that the significant number of them, coupled with their independence from one other, provides evidence of their being intentionally established with conscious life in mind.

Objections to fine-tuning arguments are multifarious. According to an anthropic principle objection, if the laws of nature and physical constants would have varied to any significant degree, there would be no conscious observers such as ourselves. Given that such observers do exist, it should not be surprising that the laws and constants are just as they are. One way of accounting for such observers is the many-worlds hypothesis. In this view, there exist a large number of universes, perhaps an infinite number of them. Most of these universes include life-prohibiting parameters, but at least a minimal number of them would probably include life-permitting ones. It should not be surprising that one of them, ours, for example, is life-permitting. Much of the current fine-tuning discussion turns on the plausibility of the many-worlds hypothesis and the anthropic principle.

There are other versions of the teleological argument that have also been proposed which focus not on fundamental parameters of the cosmos but on different aspects of living organisms—including their emergence, alleged irreducibly complex systems within living organisms, information intrinsic within DNA, and the rise of consciousness—in an attempt to demonstrate intelligent, intentional qualities in the world. These biological and noölogical design arguments have not generally received as much attention as the fine-tuning argument by those engaged in natural theology or by the broader philosophical community.

Other arguments for the existence of God (or theism) include the moral argument, the argument from mind, the argument from religion experience, and Pascal’s wager. One common objection to the traditional arguments for God’s existence is that even if they are successful, they do not prove the existence of the deity of any particular religion. If successful, the cosmological argument only provides evidence for a transcendent first cause of the universe, nothing more; at best, the teleological argument provides evidence for a purposive, rational designer of the universe, nothing more; and so on. These conclusions are very different from the God (or gods) depicted in the Qur’an, or the Bible, or the Vedas.

Natural theologians maintain, however, that the central aim of these arguments is not to offer full-blown proofs of any particular deity, but rather to provide evidence or warrant for belief in a grand designer, or creator, or moral lawgiver. Some natural theologians argue that it is best to combine the various arguments in order to provide a cumulative case for a broad form of theism. Cosmological arguments provide insight into God’s creative providence; teleological arguments provide insight into God’s purposive nature and grand intelligence; and moral arguments provide insight into God’s moral nature and character. Taken together, these natural theologians argue, the classical arguments offer a picture of a deity not unlike the God of the theistic religious traditions and even if this approach does not prove the existence of any particular deity, it does nonetheless lend support to theism over naturalism (which, as used here, is the view that natural entities have only natural causes, and that the world is fully describable by the physical sciences).

Along with arguments for the existence of God, there are also a number of reasons one might have for denying the existence of God. One reason is that a person just does not find the arguments for God’s existence to be sufficiently compelling. If the burden is on the theist to provide highly convincing evidences or reasons that would warrant his or her believing that God exists, in the absence of such evidences and reasons disbelief is justified. Another reason one might have for not believing that God exists is that science conflicts with theistic beliefs and, given the great success of the scientific enterprise, it should have the last word on the matter. Since science has regularly rebuffed religious claims in the past, we should expect the claims of religion to eventually become extinct. A third possible reason for denying the existence of God is that the very concept of God is incoherent. And a fourth reason one might have is that the existence of God conflicts with various features of the natural world, such as evil, pain, and suffering.

d. The Challenge of Science

Over the last several hundred years there has been tremendous growth in scientific understanding of the world in such fields as biology, astronomy, physics, and geology. These advances have had considerable influence on religious belief. When religious texts, such as the Bible, have been in conflict with science, the latter has generally been the winner in the debate; religious beliefs have commonly given way to the power of the scientific method. For example, the three-tiered universe held by the biblical authors, with heaven above the sky, hell below the earth, and the sun moving around the earth (and with the sun stopping its rotation during battle at Joshua’s command), is no longer plausible given what we now know. It has seemed to some that modern science will be able to explain all of the fundamental questions of life with no remainder.

Given the advances of science and the retreat of religious beliefs, many in the latter half of the twentieth century agreed with the general Freudian view that a new era was on the horizon in which the infantile illusions, or perhaps delusions, of religion would soon go the way of the ancient Greek and Roman gods. With the onset of the twenty-first century, however, a new narrative has emerged. Religion has not fallen into oblivion, as many anticipated; in fact, religious belief is on the rise. Many factors account for this, including challenges to psychological and sociological theories which hold belief in God to be pathological or neurotic. In recent decades these theories have themselves been challenged by medical and psychological research, being understood by many to be theories designed primarily to destroy belief in God. Another important factor is the increase in the number of believing and outspoken scientists, such as Francis Collins, the director of the human genome project.

At the other end of the spectrum regarding religion, however, is a fairly small but vocal band of intellectual atheists who have spawned a movement dubbed the “New Atheism.” These atheists, whose leading voices include Richard Dawkins, Christopher Hitchens, Sam Harris, and Daniel Dennett, attempt to demonstrate that respect for belief in God is irrational and socially unacceptable. But despite this orchestrated opposition arguing the falsity and incoherence of theism, it has proved rather resilient. Indeed, the twenty-first century is reflecting a renewed interest in philosophical theism.

e. The Coherence of Theism

Philosophical challenges to theism have also included the claim that the very concept of God makes no sense—that the attributes ascribed to God are logically incoherent (either individually or collectively). There are first-rate philosophers today who argue that theism is coherent and others of equal stature who argue that theism is incoherent. Much of the criticism of the concept of theism has focused on God as understood in Judaism, Christianity, and Islam, but it is also relevant to the theistic elements found within Mahayana Buddhism, Hinduism, Confucianism, and certain forms of African and Native American religions. The question of whether theism is coherent is an important one, for if there is reason to believe that theism is incoherent, theistic belief is in an important sense undermined.

The logical consistency of each of the divine attributes of classical theism has been challenged by both adherents and non-adherents of theism. Consider the divine attribute of omniscience. If God knows what you will freely do tomorrow, then it is the case now that you will indeed do that tomorrow. But how can you be free not to do that thing tomorrow if it is true now that you will in fact freely do that thing tomorrow? There is a vast array of replies to this puzzle, but some philosophers conclude that omniscience is incompatible with future free action and that, since there is future free action, God—if God exists—is not omniscient.

Another objection to the coherence of theism has to do with the divine attribute of omnipotence and is referred to as the stone paradox. An omnipotent being, as traditionally understood, is a being who can bring about anything. So, an omnipotent being could create a stone that was too heavy for such a being to lift. But if he could not lift the stone, he would not be omnipotent, and if he could not make such a stone, he would not be omnipotent. Hence, no such being exists. A number of replies have been offered to this puzzle, but some philosophers conclude that the notion of omnipotence as traditionally defined is incoherent and must be redefined if the concept of God is to remain a plausible one.

Arguments for the incoherence of theism have been offered for each of the divine attributes. While there have been many challenges to the classical attributes of God, there are also contemporary philosophers and theologians who have defended each of them as traditionally understood. There is much lively discussion currently underway by those defending both the classical and neo-classical views of God. But not all theistic philosophers and theologians have believed that the truths of religious beliefs can be or even should be demonstrated or rationally justified. As mentioned above, fideists, such as Søren Kierkegaard (1813–1855), maintain that religious faith does not need rational justification or the support of rational arguments. For fideists, attempting to prove one’s religious faith may even be an indication of a lack of faith.

5. Problems of Evil and Suffering

a. Logical Problems

Perhaps the most compelling and noteworthy argument against theism is what is referred to as the problem of evil. Philosophers of the East and the West have long recognized that difficulties arise for one who affirms both the existence of an omnipotent and omnibenevolent God and the reality of evil. David Hume, quoting the ancient Greek thinker Epicurus (341–270 B.C.E.), got to the heart of the matter with the following pithy observation:

Is he [God] willing to prevent evil, but not able? then he is impotent. Is he able, but not willing? then he is malevolent. Is he both able and willing? whence then is evil? (Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Part X, 63)

There are different ways the problem of evil can be formulated. In fact, it is probably more accurate to refer to “problems” of evil. One formulation is construed as a logical problem. For the logical problem of evil, it is asserted that the two claims, (1) an omnipotent and omnibenevolent God exists, and (2) evil exists, are logically incompatible. Since evil ostensibly exists, the argument goes, God (understood traditionally as being omnipotent and omnibenevolent) must not exist.

In the latter half of the twentieth century, the logical argument held sway. But by the end of that century, it was widely acknowledged by philosophers of religion that the logical problem had been rebutted. One reason is that as claims (1) and (2) are not explicitly contradictory, there must be hidden premises or unstated assumptions which make them so. But what might those be? The assumed premises/assumptions appear to be something along these lines: (a) an omnipotent God could create any world, (b) an omnibenevolent God would prefer a world without evil over a world with evil, and (c) God would create the world he prefers. Given these claims, (1) and (2) would be logically incompatible. However, it turns out that at least (a) may not be true, even on a classical theistic account. It could be that a world with free agents is more valuable than a world with no free agents. Further, it could be that such free agents cannot be caused or determined to do only what is morally right and good, even by God. If this is so, in order for God to create agents who are capable of moral good, God had to create agents who are capable of moral evil as well. If this is a logical possibility, and it seems to be so, then premise (a) is not a necessary truth because God cannot create just any world.

In addition, premise (b) is not necessarily true either. For all we know, God could use evil to achieve some good end, such as bringing about the virtues of compassion and mercy. As long as (a) and (b) are possibly false, the conclusion of the argument is no longer necessarily true, so it loses its deductive force. This response to the logical argument from evil is called a defense, which is distinguished from a theodicy. The aim of a defense is to demonstrate that the arguments from evil are unsuccessful given a possible scenario or set of scenarios, whereas a theodicy is an attempt to justify God and the ways of God given the evil and suffering in the world. Both defenses and theodicies have been used by theists in responding to the various problems of evil.

b. Evidential Problems

Evidential arguments attempt to demonstrate that the existence of evil in the world counts as inductive evidence against the claim that God exists. One form of the evidential argument from evil is based on the assumption, often agreed on by theists and atheists alike, that an omnipotent, omniscient, omnibenevolent being would prevent the existence of significant amounts of gratuitous evil. Since significant amounts of gratuitous evil seem to exist, God probably does not. One influential approach, espoused by William Rowe (1931), contends that many evils, such as the slow and agonizing death of a fawn burned in a forest fire ignited by lightning, appear to be gratuitous. However, an omnipotent and omniscient being could have prevented them from occurring, and an omnibenevolent being would have not allowed any significant pointless evils to occur if they could have been avoided. So, the argument concludes, it is more reasonable to disbelieve that God exists.

One way of responding to such arguments is to attempt to demonstrate that there is, after all, a point to each of the seemingly gratuitous evils. A solid case for even some examples would lower the probability of the evidential argument, and one could maintain that normal epistemic limitations restrict knowledge in many other examples. The theistic traditions historically have, in fact, affirmed the inscrutability of God and the ways of God. It is from within this context that Stephen Wykstra developed a response to the evidential argument, a response that is referred to as “skeptical theism” (not to be taken as being skeptical about theism). The central point of skeptical theism is that because of human cognitive limitations we are unable to judge as improbable the claim that there are various goods secured by God’s allowing the evils in the world.

Rowe has provided responses to skeptical theism, one of which is that on this view one could never have any reason for doubting God’s existence given evil, no matter how horrific the evil turns out to be. The skeptical theist has created a chasm between human and divine knowledge far beyond what theism has traditionally affirmed.

Another version of the evidential argument has been advanced by Paul Draper. He argues that the world as it is, with its distribution of pains and pleasures, is more likely given what he calls a “hypothesis of indifference” than given theism. On this hypothesis, the existence of sentient beings (including their nature and their place) is neither the result of a benevolent nor a malevolent nonhuman person. Contrast this with the theistic account in which, since God is morally perfect, there must be morally good reasons for allowing biologically useless pain, and there must be morally good reasons for producing pleasures even if such pleasures are not biologically useful. But given our observations of the pains and pleasures experienced by sentient creatures, including their biologically gratuitous experiences (such as those brought about by biological evolution), the hypothesis of indifference provides a more reasonable account than theism.

In response, Peter van Inwagen (1942) maintains that this argument can be countered by contending that for all we know, in every possible world which exhibits a high degree of complexity (such as ours with sentient, intelligent life) the laws of nature are the same or have the same general features as the actual laws. We cannot assume, then, that the distribution of pain and pleasure (including the pains and pleasures reflected in biological evolution) in a world with a high degree of complexity such as ours would be any different given theism. We are simply not epistemically capable of accurately assigning a probability either way, so we cannot make the judgment that theism is less likely than the hypothesis of indifference.

When assessing arguments of this sort, some important questions for consideration are these: What is the claim probable or improbable with respect to? And what is the relevant background information with respect to the claim? The plausibility of the claim “God’s existence is improbable with respect to the evil in the world” considered alone may well be very different from the plausibility of the claim “God’s existence is improbable with respect to the evil in the world” when considered in conjunction with, say, one or more of the arguments for God’s existence. Furthermore, the theist can offer other hypotheses which may raise the probability of evil given God’s existence. For example, the major theistic traditions affirm the belief that God’s purposes are not restricted to this earthly life but extend on into an afterlife as well. In this case, there is further opportunity for God to bring moral good out of the many kinds and varieties of evil in this life. Thus the full scope of the considerations and evidences for and against theism may well raise the probability of God’s existence above that of taking into account only a part. Nevertheless, the evidential problem of evil remains a central argument type against the plausibility of theism.

c. Theodicy

A theodicy, unlike a defense, takes on the burden of attempting to vindicate God by providing a plausible explanation for evil. The theodical approach often takes the following general form: God, an omnipotent and omnibenevolent being, will prevent/eliminate evil unless there is a good reason or set of reasons for not doing so. There is evil in the world. Therefore God must have a good reason or set of reasons for not preventing/eliminating evil. There are various attempts to demonstrate what that good reason is, or those good reasons are. Two important theodicies are those that appeal to the significance and value of free will, and those that appeal to the significance and value of acquiring virtuous traits of character in the midst of suffering.

The first fully developed theodicy was crafted by Augustine in the fifth century of the common era. For Augustine, God is perfect in goodness, and the universe, God’s creation, is also good and exists for a good purpose. Since all creation is intrinsically good, evil must not represent the positive existence of any substantial thing. Evil, then, turns out to be a metaphysical privation, a privatio boni (privation of goodness), or the going wrong of something that is inherently good.

Both moral and natural evil, for Augustine, entered the universe through the wrongful use of free will. Since all creatures, both angels and humans, are finite and mutable, they have the capacity to choose evil, which they have done. Thus, while God created everything in the world good, including angels and humans, through the use of their wills these free agents have ushered into the world that which is contrary to the good. Much of what is good has become corrupted, and this corruption stems from these free creatures, not from God. The Augustinian theodicy concludes with the culmination of history entailing cosmic justice. For God will, in the eschaton (the end of time), usher all who repent into the eternal bliss of heaven and castigate to hell all those who, through their free will, have rejected God’s gift of salvation.

One objection to Augustine’s theodicy is that a number of evils are brought about by natural events, such as disease and natural disasters, including earthquakes and tsunamis. These evils do not seem to occur because of the free choices of moral creatures. The free will theodicy, then, is ineffectual as a solution to arguments from evil that include natural events such as these. C. S. Lewis, Alvin Plantinga, and others have proposed that supernatural beings may ultimately be responsible for evils of this kind, but most theodicists are skeptical of such a notion.

Another objection to this theodicy is that it was crafted in a pre-scientific culture and thus is devoid of an evolutionary view of the development of flora and fauna, including such elements as predation and species annihilation. The narrative of an originally perfect creation through which evil entered by the choices of free agents is now generally considered to be mistaken and unhelpful.

The soul-making (or person-making) theodicy was developed by John Hick, utilizing ideas from the early Christian thinker and bishop Irenaeus (c.130–c.202 C.E.). According to this theodicy, as advanced by Hick, God created the world as a good place, but no paradise, for developing morally and spiritually mature beings. Through evolutionary means, God is bringing about such individuals who have the freedom of will and the capacity to mature in love and goodness. Individuals placed in this challenging environment of our world, one in which there is epistemic distance between God and human persons, have the opportunity to choose, through their own free responses, what is right and good and thus develop into the mature persons that God desires them to be—exhibiting the virtues of patience, courage, generosity, and so on.

Evil, then, is the result of both the creation of a soul-making environment and of the human choices to act against what is right and good. While there is much evil in the world, nevertheless the trajectory of the world is toward the good, and God will continue to work with human (and perhaps other) persons, even in the afterlife if necessary, such that in the eschaton everyone will finally be brought to a place of moral and spiritual maturity.

One objection to the soul-making theodicy is that there are many evils in the world that seem to have nothing to do with character development. Gratuitous evils appear to be in abundance. Furthermore, there is no empirical support for the claim that the world is structured for soul making. Many persons appear to make no moral progress after much suffering; in fact, some persons seem to be worse off by the end of their earthly life.

In reply, it can be argued that apparently pointless evils are not always, in fact, without purpose and merit. The compassion that is evoked from such seemingly indiscriminate and unfair miseries, for example, is a great good, and one which may not arise without the miseries appearing as unfair and indiscriminate. While God did not intend or need any particular evils for soul-making purposes, God did arguably need to create an environment where such evils were a possibility. Thus, while each individual instance of evil may not be justified by a particular greater good, the existence of a world where evil is possible is necessary for a world where soul making can occur. Furthermore, with this theodicy a positive doctrine of life after death is central, for there are cases in which difficulties in an individual’s life breed bitterness, anger, and even a reduction of virtuous character. So in these instances, at least, the soul-making process would need to continue on in the afterlife.

The free will and soul-making theodicies share a common supposition that God would not permit evil which is not necessary for a greater good. But many theists maintain that some evils are not justified, that some horrors are so damaging that there are no goods which outweigh them. But if there are such evils, the question can be raised why God would allow them. It may be that standard theism, theism unaccompanied by other religious claims, is inadequate to provide a response. In fact, some have argued that an adequate reply requires an expanded theism which incorporates other particular religious claims.

One such approach has been offered by Marilyn McCord Adams (1943–). Utilizing the resources of her own religious tradition, Adams pushes theodicy beyond a general theism to an expanded Christian theism utilizing a Christocentric theological framework. She focuses on the worst sorts of evils, which she calls “horrendous evils.” These are evils which, when experienced by a particular person, give that person reason to doubt whether her life could, considered in totality, be taken to be a great good to her. Adams argues that the Christian theodicist should abandon the widely held assumption that responses to evil can only include those goods that both theists and atheists acknowledge. She maintains that goods of this sort are finite and temporal, whereas the Christian has infinite and eternal goods at her disposal. An intimate, loving, eternal relationship with God, for example, may well be a good that is infinite and incomparable with any other kind of good. She further argues that taking a “general reasons-why” approach to theodicy in which some general reason is provided to cover all forms of evil does not seem to be the kind of help we need. As a Christian philosopher, she believes a more adequate response can be provided which involves the coexistence of God and the evils in the world. Rather than focusing on the possible reasons why God might allow evils of this sort, she maintains that it is enough to show how God can be good and yet permit their existence.

Adams argues that there is good reason for the Christian to believe that all evils will ultimately be defeated in one’s life and that God will ultimately engulf all personal horrors through integrating participation in the evils into one’s life with God. Given this integration, she argues, all human beings, even those who have experienced the most horrific evils on earth, will in the eschaton be redeemed and thus find ultimate meaning and goodness in their lives. Such a view does, of course, presuppose one particular religious tradition and one interpretation of that tradition.

Another recent approach to the problem of evil has been offered by Eleonore Stump. She considers the problem to be not an intellectual one attempting to solve a logical puzzle, but rather a deeply personal one involving interpersonal relations, the central relations of which are between God and God’s creatures. She treats the problem of evil as centrally a problem of suffering and utilizes an account of second-person experiences and second-person biblical narratives to make her case.

Stump suggests a possible world, one grounded in the worldview of Thomas Aquinas, in which love is central. The proper object of love is God, which, on Aquinas’s doctrine of divine simplicity, is identical to God’s goodness. This goodness is also within human beings, and so a proper object of love includes love of other human beings (as well as oneself). Fallen human beings prefer pleasure and power over the greater goods, and as such human beings are not properly internally integrated around the ultimate and proper good. One must be redeemed in order to have proper internal integration.

Using the biblical story of Job, Stump sees several levels of second-person accounts, including God’s interactions with Job and a dialogue between God and Satan. Job, she suggests, received what he needed: an assurance of God’s goodness. But the way Job received this assurance, the way he knows that his suffering is under the providence of a good and loving God, occurs through a second-person experience that is difficult to explain to one who did not have the same experience. What we have in these accounts, then, are second-person stories relating God’s personal interaction with his creatures. What we learn from such biblical stories is that God will produce goods from one’s suffering for the one suffering—goods which would otherwise have not been produced.

One objection to Stump’s defense is that, in many cases, suffering seems to produce no growth or goods in the individual who is suffering. In fact, in some cases, suffering seems to predictably diminish the sufferer. Furthermore, much evil and suffering seems to be indiscriminate and gratuitous.

d. The Hiddenness of God

A related problem is that of divine hiddenness. Many people are perplexed and see as problematic that, if God exists, God does not make his existence sufficiently clear and available. The problem, concisely stated, can be put this way. If God exists as the perfect, loving, omnibenevolent being that theists have generally taken God to be, then God would desire the best for his creatures. The best for God’s creatures, at least in the Christian religion and to some extent in all of the Abrahamic traditions, is to be in relationship with God. However, many people, both non-theists and sometimes theists themselves, claim to have no awareness of God. Why would God remain hidden and elusive, especially when individuals would benefit from being aware of God?

John Schellenberg has argued that the hiddenness of God provides evidence that God does not in fact exist. Using a child-parent analogy, an analogy which is often used in the Abrahamic traditions themselves, Schellenberg notes that good parents are present to their children, especially when they are in need. But God is nowhere to be found, whether one is in need or not. So God, at least as traditionally understood, must not exist.

Schellenberg offers several different forms of the argument. One version can be sketched this way. If God does exist, then reasonable nonbelief would not occur, for surely a perfectly loving God would desire that people believe in God. And if God desires that people so believe, God would work it out so that persons would be in a reasonable position to believe. However, reasonable nonbelief does occur. There are persons who do not believe in God, and they are reasonable in doing so. Even after studying the evidence, examining their motives of belief, praying and seeking God, they still do not believe and see no good reason to believe. But a perfectly loving and good God, it seems, would ensure belief in God by all such persons. God would make himself known to them so that they would believe. Since there is reasonable nonbelief, then, we have solid evidence that God, as a perfectly loving, caring being does, not exist. The argument can be stated concisely this way:

  1. If there is a God, he is perfectly loving.
  2. If a perfectly loving God exists, reasonable nonbelief does not occur.
  3. Reasonable nonbelief occurs.
  4. So no perfectly loving God exists (from 2 and 3).

Various replies can be made to this argument. While not a common move by theists, one could deny the first premise. Dystheists maintain that God is less (maybe much less) than omnibenevolent. This view of God is certainly not consistent with traditional theism whereby, as Anselm put it, God is “that than which nothing greater can be conceived.”

Another reply is to deny premise two, and several reasons might be offered in support of its denial. First, it may be that those persons who do not believe are, for one reason or another, not ready to believe that God exists, perhaps because of emotional or psychological or other reasons. So God hides out of love and concern for the person. Second, it could be that God’s revealing himself to some people would produce the wrong kind of belief or knowledge of God or could cause one to believe for the wrong reasons, perhaps out of fear or trepidation or an egoistic desire for success. In cases like this, God’s hiding would, again, be due to God’s love and concern for those who are not yet ready to believe.

A third reply is to deny the third premise. Some theists have, in fact, maintained that any nonbelief of God is unreasonable—that every case of nonbelief is one in which the person is epistemically and morally culpable for her nonbelief. That is, while such persons do not believe that God exists, they should so believe. They have the requisite evidence to warrant such belief, yet they deny or suppress it; they are intentionally disbelieving.

For many philosophers of religion, these replies to the issue of divine hiddenness are unsatisfactory. The elusiveness of God continues to be a problem for both theists and non-theists.

e. Karma and Reincarnation

Non-theistic religions have also offered accounts of evil, including its nature and existence, specifically with respect to suffering. For Hindus and Buddhists, these considerations are rooted in karma and rebirth. In its popular formulations, rebirth is the view that the conscious self transmigrates from one physical body to the next after death. Each human being has lived former lives, perhaps as another human being or maybe even as another kind of organism. Rebirth is connected to the doctrine of karma. As typically understood within Hinduism and Buddhism, karma literally means “deed” or “action”—what one does. It can also mean one’s intention or motivation for a given action, or what happens to an individual. Its broader meaning, sometimes referred to as the “law of karma,” is a law of moral causation, including the results of one’s actions. Understood this way, it involves causal connections linking what an individual does to what happens to them. It is, in effect, the idea that one reaps the good and bad consequences of her or his actions, either in this life or in another life.

Reincarnation and karma seem to offer a better account of evil and suffering than does theism. For example, it seems exceedingly unfair that one child is born healthy into a wealthy, loving family, whereas another child is born sickly into a poor, cruel environment. If there is a personal, creator God who brought these two persons into the world, God seems to be unloving and unjust. But if the two children are reaping the consequences of actions they performed in previous lives, this seems to provide a justification for the inequalities. The effect of one’s karma determines the circumstances of one’s past, present, and future lives. We reap what we sow.

Various objections have also been raised against karma/rebirth. According to the karmic law of cause and effect, a person’s present life circumstances are explained by her actions in a previous life; and her life circumstances in that life are explained by her life circumstances in a life previous to that one; and so on indefinitely. So the solution hoped for regarding inequalities never seems to come to an end. Furthermore, does it really seem fair that when a person who has lived a long life dies and is reincarnated, she must start all over again as a baby with her maturity, life experiences, wisdom, and memories completely erased?

Another difficulty for the karma/rebirth solution has to do with free will. An initial advantage of this solution to the problem of evil is that real moral agency is preserved. In fact, moral agency is central to the karma/rebirth solution: our moral decisions self-determine our future experiences, making us responsible for our own destiny. Upon further reflection, the view seems to run contrary to free moral agency. Consider the example of a man contemplating the rape and murder of a woman. Suppose he has done so before, and has thus far not been caught. He is considering redirecting his life by turning himself in to the authorities and receiving the consequences of his actions. But just as he is pondering this option, a woman strolls by and his mad passions for rape and murder begin to burn within him. He now has the choice to continue down the path of destruction or put a stop to it. If he decides to attack the woman and does so, then on the karmic account the woman was not completely innocent after all; she is paying the price for her former evil actions. In that case, the rapist is not truly free to act as he does, for he is simply following mechanistically the effects of karmic justice. He is merely the instrumental means for meting out the justice requisite for this woman’s previous moral failings. If, however, the woman does not deserve such moral recompense, then karmic justice will ensure that she does not receive it. In that case, the rapist will be unable to engage in the attack.

The problem that arises has to do with locating the moral freedom in this system. If the rapist is deterministically carrying out justice on his victim, then it seems that he is not truly a free moral agent after all. He is simply a cog in the karmic justice machine. It is disconcerting to affirm a moral system in which we understand raped and murdered victims to be themselves morally culpable for such acts of brutality against them. On the other hand, suppose the rapist really is free to attack the woman. If she was not deserving of such an act, this would be a serious violation of the law of karma whereby suffering occurs only because of one’s previous evil actions. If in attempting to justify such actions, the defender of the karmic system replied that the woman would in a future life receive a reward for such a morally gratuitous act, this does not appear to be consistent with karma, for this would run counter to the central principle of karma in which evil and suffering are the effects of one’s previous deeds.

As with theistic replies to evil, karmic solutions may be helpful at some level, but they nevertheless leave one with less than complete answers to the variety of problems of evil and suffering.

6. Miracles

The term “miracle” (Latin mirari, to wonder) is generally used in religious contexts to refer to an unusual event which is not explicable by natural causes alone but rather is the result of divine activity. Theists commonly consider most of the events that occur in the world to be, fundamentally, acts of God. As creator and sustainer of the universe, God is, broadly construed, the ultimate cause of what occurs in the universe. But many theists also affirm that some events involve a direct act of God, such as “miraculous” healings or in the case of Christian theism, the resurrection of Jesus, or in the case of Islam, the production of the Qur’an.

But there is debate among philosophers of religion about what kinds of divine activity should be considered miraculous. David Hume maintained that a miracle is a “violation of the laws of nature.” As such, he raised objections to such a notion. One objection is that it is never reasonable to believe a report that a violation of a law of nature has occurred. The evidence used to support a claim of a miraculous event is the testimony of witnesses. But the establishment of a natural law was based on the uniform experience of many persons over time. So the witness testimony necessary to establish a miracle would need to be greater than that which established the natural law in the first place. Since this never happens, no evidence is sufficient to make probable or establish the occurrence of a violation of a natural law, so it is always unreasonable to believe that such a violation has occurred.

Objections have been raised to Hume’s definition of a miracle. One objection is that miracles are not in fact violations of natural laws. Natural laws are descriptive rather than prescriptive; they describe what will, or likely will, occur or not occur under certain specifiable conditions. In that case, referring to God’s occasional actions in the world as a violation of them would be misrepresentative. If what one means by a violation of the laws of nature is just an exception to usual processes in the natural world, however, this objection is unwarranted.

This leads back to the issue of whether it is ever reasonable to believe that an exception to the usual processes in the natural world has occurred, and also whether it can be established that God has directly acted in the world. Hume does not attempt to demonstrate that miracles are a metaphysical impossibility. His approach is an epistemic one: to show that there is never sufficient evidence to warrant belief in a miracle.

One response to Hume’s claim about the insufficiency of evidence for belief in miracles is that his understanding of probability is inadequate. Determining the probability of an event is a rather complex undertaking, and simply utilizing the frequency of an occurrence to determine its probability, as Hume apparently does, simply will not do. Establishing the a priori probability of a miracle without the background information of, for example, the existence of God, the nature of God, the purposes and plans of God, and so on, is impossible. If one had such knowledge, a particular miracle may turn out to be highly probable.

Recent discussions of miracles by philosophers of religion have often focused on the concept of natural law, probability theory, and the role of religion as evidence for a particular religion or for belief in God.

7. Conclusion

Philosophy of religion is a flourishing field. Beyond those specific areas described above, there are also a number of important currents emerging, including feminist and continental approaches, renewed interest in medieval philosophy of religion, and an emphasis on the environment, race and ethnicity, and science and faith.

8. References and Further Reading

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  • Anderson, Pamela Sue. “What’s Wrong with the God’s Eye Point of View: A Constructive Feminist Critique of the Ideal Observer Theory.” In Faith and Philosophical Analysis: The Impact of Analytical Philosophy on the Philosophy of Religion, Harriet Harris and C. J. Insole, eds. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2005.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. St. Anselm: Basic Writings. LaSalle, IL: Open Court Publishing, [1077–1078] 1962.
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  • Bergmann, Michael and Michael Rea. “In Defense of Skeptical Theism: A Reply to Almeida and Oppy.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 83 (2005): 241–251.
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Author Information

Chad Meister
Bethel College (Indiana)
U. S. A.

Immanuel Kant: Radical Evil

kant2 The subject of Immanuel Kant’s philosophy of religion has received more attention in the beginning of the 21st century than it did in Kant’s own time. Religion was an unavoidable topic for Kant since it addresses the ultimate questions of metaphysics and morality. For, as he presents it in his Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals and elsewhere, the universal moral law does not entirely depend upon demonstrating the existence of God, but rather upon reason (though he believes that its source cannot be divorced from the concept of God). Nevertheless he shocks the casual reader of the First Preface of his Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (hereafter Religion) by claiming that morality “inevitably leads to religion.”

Obedience to the moral law, of which Kant believes religion should be an example, appears to be an expectation that is neither universally nor willingly practiced. What is notable about the first two chapters of Religion is that he addresses this phenomenon in a manner that his Enlightenment predecessors had not: The failure of human moral agents to observe the moral law is symptomatic of a character or disposition (Gesinnung) that has been corrupted by an innate propensity to evil, which is to subordinate the moral law to self-conceit. Because this propensity corrupts an agent’s character as a whole, and is the innate “source” of every other evil deed, it may be considered “radical.” However, this propensity can be overcome through a single and unalterable “revolution” in the mode of thought (Revolution für die Denkungsart), which is simultaneously the basis for a gradual reform of character in the mode of sense (für die Sinnesart); for without the former, there is no basis for the latter. This reformation of character ultimately serves as the ground for moral agents within an ethical commonwealth, which, when understood eschatologically, is the Kingdom of God on Earth.

Kant’s account of radical evil demonstrates how evil can be a genuine moral alternative while nevertheless being an innate condition. Given the general optimism of the time, Kant’s view was revolutionary. It not only harkened back to an older Augustinian account of human nature, but also affirmed a propensity to evil within human nature using his apparatus of practical reason.

Table of Contents

  1. Kant on the Natural Predisposition to Good and the Propensity to Evil
  2. The Propensity to Evil: Universal and Innate
  3. The Source of the Propensity to Radical Evil: Two Views
  4. Overcoming Evil: The Necessity of an Ethical-Religious Revolution
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary References
      1. German
      2. English
    2. Secondary References

1. Kant on the Natural Predisposition to Good and the Propensity to Evil

Kant’s account of radical evil in Religion must be seen within the context of his account of why, given the force of the moral law, rational beings would actually choose evil. The presence of moral evil in human beings can be explained by their possession of an innate propensity to subordinate the moral law to inclination. Of course, for Kant to even suggest that human beings have such a propensity places him at odds with the Enlightenment Zeitgeist, which saw human beings as neither wholly good nor wholly evil, but somewhere in between (“latitudinarianism”). He ultimately rejected this and in his Religion, he not only shows that a universal propensity to radical evil is possible, but also gives an account of how it is possible.

Contrary to the latitudinarianism of Jean-Jacques Rousseau and others on the subject of human nature, Kant holds to the following rigoristic thesis: Ethically, human beings are either wholly evil or wholly good by virtue of whether or not an agent has adopted the moral law as the governing maxim for all of his or her maxims (Religion 6:22-23). For either the moral law is the governing maxim for the choice of maxims or it is not; making the moral law the ground of our maxims is sufficient for moral goodness. This thesis turns on a second thesis: An individual with a morally good character or disposition (Gessinnung) has adopted a moral maxim as a governing maxim, and incorporates the moral law as a basis for choosing all other maxims. If an agent has done so, then by virtue of making all other maxims compliant with this maxim, these subsequent maxims will be consistent with the moral law. Nevertheless, when an alternative maxim—that of self-conceit—is chosen as a governing maxim, then this egoistic alternative becomes the basis for maxim choice and the moral law is subordinated to an alternative governing maxim along with every other maxim.

Consequently, the ethical choice facing the moral agent is either to subordinate all other maxims to the moral law, or to subordinate the moral law with every other maxim to an egoistic alternative. The fact is that human agents, although conscious of the moral law, nevertheless do in fact incorporate the occasional deviation from it as part of their individual maxim set. When an agent mis-subordinates the requirements of morality to the incentives of self-conceit (however small it may be), the result is radical evil (Religion 6.32).

Note that this propensity does not amount to the rejection of morality. It is in fact perfectly compatible with our acceptance of the requirements of the moral law, but only insofar as they are compatible with a maxim of inclination. But the next question, as always with Kant, must be one of possibility: how is it that radical evil is even possible for human agents?

Every human being possesses the incentive to adopt the moral law as the governing maxim for maxim choice by virtue of it having arisen out of a basic predisposition to the good. As such, an individual’s predisposition constitutes the determinate nature (Bestimmung) of a human being as a whole, of which Kant identifies three basic predispositions (Anlagen): animality (Thierheit), personality (Persönlichkeit), and humanity (Menschlichheit). They belong to us as part of our motivational DNA. By itself, a predisposition is generally not a conscious choice, but a source of motivation for choices, some of which happen to have ethical significance. The basic predispositions, taken as a whole, are considered good in the sense that, not only do they not resist the moral law, but they also demand compliance with it  (Religion 6:28). For a human agent to have an original predisposition to the good yet nevertheless to be capable of evil, suggests that the possibility for the corruption of human nature is a consequence of the corruption of one of our basic predispositions.

Although it would be tempting to do so, it would be a mistake to identify the source of this corruption in our sensuous animal nature (the predisposition to animality). This predisposition concerns itself with the purely instinctual elements of the human being qua mammal: self-preservation, the sexual drive, and the desire for community. While the inclinations of animality indeed influence us ignobly, they are nevertheless necessary for every member of the species to survive and flourish. Hence human sensuality and appetite alone could hardly make human beings radically evil. As Kant states (Religion 6:35): “For not only do [the natural inclinations] bear no direct relation to evil . . . we also cannot presume ourselves responsible for their existence (we cannot because as connatural to us, natural inclinations do not have us for their author).”

Yet neither can our predisposition to personality be identified with our moral corruption, since Kant attributes to personality the capacity not only to grasp but also to determine the maxims that are morally required of us as universal legislation. For unlike the predisposition to animality, the predisposition to personality shares, with humanity, the property of rationality. The incentive to follow the moral law thus requires a distinct predisposition, so that the moral law can be an incentive given “from within” that stands in contrast to a circumstantially dependent happiness. It is the “highest incentive” (Religion 6:26n) by which we both grasp and choose the moral law, and it provides the basis for our personhood, if not our accountability. For this reason radical evil cannot constitute a “corruption of the morally legislative reason” (Religion 6:35).

This leaves humanity as the remaining basic predisposition susceptible to corruption. Although it shares the property of rationality with the predisposition to personality, humanity is distinct by virtue of the fact that it is concerned with the practical and therefore calculative elements of life. Yet this basic predisposition also possesses the inclination to seek equality in the eyes of others and to determine whether or not one is happy by comparison with others (Religion 6:26-27). It is manifestly egocentric since it relates to others in terms of its concern for happiness. Yet it is not by itself evil. Rather, it is from these positive characteristics within our predisposition of humanity that evil becomes a possibility and constitutes a propensity to egoistic and malignant self-love as self-conceit.

2. The Propensity to Evil: Universal and Innate

Once Kant is able to show how radical evil, as an innate condition, is possible the question becomes: How can evil, insofar as it rests on a propensity, constitute a genuine choice? In many ways, this question appears to be the essential problem for Kant’s ethics, since he believes that rational moral agency entails not only the capacity to know but also to obey the moral law.

Generally speaking, a propensity (Hang) is an innate yet non-necessary feature of every person that serves as a motivation for action in distinctively human affairs.  However, unlike a basic predisposition (e.g., humanity, animality, and personality), a propensity can be represented as having been acquired by habit if it is good, or if it is evil, as having been self-inflicted (Religion 6:29). It demonstrates a tendency to respond or act in a particular manner, either in accordance with, or in tension with the moral law. Taken together, both predispositions and propensities serve to form an individual’s mindset or character (Gessinnung), for the development of which every human being is responsible.

The obvious requirement for Kant at this stage is to give an account of the nature of the propensity to evil, which he provides in psychological terms as a disordering of incentives. As opposed to other vices, this propensity is essentially depravity, and stands in contrast to frailty (fragilitas) and moral impurity (impuritas, improbitas). Depravity or perversity (perversitas), unlike frailty, is not mere weakness and an inability to resist sensuous inclination (Religion 6:29). And unlike impurity, it is more than merely obeying the moral law from alternative motivations (instead of a sense of duty). Instead, depravity must be understood as the reversal of “the ethical order as regards the incentives of a free power of choice” (Religion 6:30). The propensity to evil becomes manifest when human beings choose to act (Willkür) in accordance with the incentive of self-conceit, which stands in opposition to the incentive of the moral law. (Religion 6:36).

Yet merely possessing the propensity to self-conceit does not by itself make an agent evil, since a moral agent already possesses both the incentive of the moral law and that of self-conceit within that agent’s hierarchy of maxims. An agent’s moral character as a whole is determined ultimately by which maxim is going to be the dominant maxim for the choice of maxims. Yet, because both cannot fulfill this role, they compete with each other with the result that one is inevitably “subordinated to the other” (Religion 6:36).  An evil character results when the moral agent makes the satisfaction of the moral law as the basis for maxim choice (Willkür) conditional to the incentives of self love (understood as self-conceit) and their inclinations (Religion 6:36). And so, what makes for an evil character is deviating from the moral law as the basis for maxim choice and adopting self-conceit in its place (Religion 6:29).

Note that for Kant, the faculty of volition or desire, or freedom of the will (Wille), has two different senses, a broad sense and a narrow sense. In the narrow sense (as Wille) it refers to the practical will that formulates laws as the “faculty of desire whose inner determining ground, hence even what pleases it, lies within the subject’s [practical] reason.” Practical will is considered in relation to the ground determining the choice of action (Metaphysics of Morals, 6:213), and through it an agent formulates both hypothetical and categorical imperatives. Practical will stands in contrast with executive will (Willkür), which is the power of choice (together with which it forms the will in the broad sense) to choose, decide, wish, and formulate maxims presented to it by the practical will as imperatives. Hence, whether or not an agent is wholly good or evil is determined entirely by “a free power of choice (Willkür) and this power . . .  on the basis of its maxims [which] must reside in the subjective ground of the possibility of the deviation of the maxims from the moral law” (Religion 6:29).

Thus, either the incentive of the moral law or the incentive of egoistic self-conceit is sufficient for the agent to be either morally good or morally evil. When the propensity to subordinate the moral law to the governing maxim of self-conceit is taken up within the mindset or disposition (Gesinnung) as a governing maxim, the agent’s character as a whole is corrupted and becomes radically evil.

3. The Source of the Propensity to Radical Evil: Two Views

The propensity to evil is affirmed by Kant as a universal yet non-necessary feature of every human being. However, he appears to believe that its universal quality entails that there is no need for proof of its innateness. As he states: “We can spare ourselves the formal proof that there must be such a corrupt propensity rooted in the human being, in view of the multitude of woeful examples that the experience of human deeds parades before us” (Religion 6:33). Such examples are obvious simply from an examination of history and anthropology (Religion 6:33-34). The fact that Kant raises the possibility of a formal proof for the innateness of this propensity while declining to give one raises the question: What is the basis for characterizing this propensity as innate?

One view is that radical evil may be cast in terms of what Kant has identified as “unsociable sociality” (ungesellige Geselligkeit; “The Idea for a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View” 8:20). It arises within the human agent from interactions within society, and its demonstration need not appeal to a litany of human evils from which to derive an inductive proof. Instead, all that is necessary is an examination of the predisposition to humanity. Recall that by virtue of this predisposition, we possess a natural tendency not only to compare ourselves with others, but to compete with each other as a means of deriving our own self-worth. From our social interactions, we learn to give preference to our own concerns and needs, or self-conceit (Religion 6:26-27). This unsociable sociality becomes manifest in our tendency to exempt ourselves from the moral law while expecting others to follow it, treating others as means to our ends rather than as ends.  And so, in human competitiveness we seek to compare and gain mastery over others, making our own preferences the basis for our governing maxim.

The source of this feature of the basic predisposition to humanity manifests itself in natural and self-aggrandizing human competitiveness. It originates out of the company of other human beings who mutually corrupt one another’s moral predispositions (Religion 6:93-94). Hence, by virtue of living in community and in our need for sociality, the shortcomings of our basic predisposition to humanity accounts for our self-conceit. Our social interactions serve as a kind of breeding ground for radical evil.

Our natural tendencies not only to compare ourselves with others, but to compete with them as a means for deriving our own self-worth, can be demonstrated through the study of anthropology. However this interpretation does not entail that Kant thinks that the individual is absolved of responsibility. Evil remains a deed that is the product of an individual’s capacity for choice, and for this reason the individual still retains the responsibility for its commission. Even if we claim that we are not guilty of a particular social evil (e.g., slavery or the Holocaust), on account of having been caught up in the “spirit of the age,” then inasmuch as we are participants, we are still guilty.

Thus on this first view, the propensity to evil is simply part of our nature as social beings and is aggravated by our proximity to each other, the existence of which is evident from an observation of unsociable sociability when, and where it occurs  in human society. It is a universal feature shared by every human being, yet it does not require holding that each individual necessarily possesses this feature.

The alternative view for the basis for the propensity’s innateness is that the subordination of the moral law to the incentive of self-conceit is an entirely timeless and intelligible “deed” (That). This wholly intelligible act is so called because it does not take place at any one point in time, but it is nevertheless the deed out of which all subsequent evil deeds arise. It is, as Kant states, the “subjective determining ground of the power of choice that precedes every deed, and is itself not yet a deed” (Religion 6:31).

In making this claim, Kant follows the more Pietist (or less orthodox Lutheran) theologians of his day who broke from an Augustinian approach towards human evil or sin, claiming that each agent is alone responsible for its own evil. Adam and Eve were responsible for their own sin, and all subsequent human beings have followed their example in disobedience to the moral law (Religion 6:42-43). Human beings, then, approach their empirical circumstances having always already chosen the maxim by which they will act, and so subordinate the moral law to the incentive of self-conceit.

An a priori proof for the innate source of this radical evil can easily be drawn out through an examination of Kant’s observation in the Critique of Practical Reason that the moral law strikes down this incentive. Here he states that only two propensities are applicable to beings capable of apprehending the moral law: to follow the moral law either gladly (gern) or reluctantly (ungern; Critque of Practical Reason 5:82).  Whether or not the moral law is followed gladly or reluctantly is in part a function of its ability to generate respect, which serves as an incentive for its adoption. As an incentive, the moral law competes with inclination for acceptance by the practical will, against which inclination sometimes wins. Viewed positively: Respect for the moral law, while illuminating to a certain extent our limitations, also reveals our dignity as rational beings. However, the incentive of respect for the moral law competes with sensuous inclinations which arise out of self-regard (Selbstsucht, solipsismus; Critique of Practical Reason 5:73).

Note that for Kant self-regard is a complex phenomenon. As a rational and guided concern for one’s own livelihood and well being (Eigenliebe, philautia; Critique of Practical Reason 5:74) self-regard constitutes a healthy benevolence towards ourselves. For “we find our nature as sensible beings so constituted that the matter of the faculty of desire (objects of inclination, whether of hope or fear) first forces itself upon us” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74). However, self-regard also subsumes a more malignant form of self-concern, that of self-conceit (Eigendünkel, arrogantia), in which the “pathologically determinable self” desires “to make its claims primary and originally valid, just as if it constituted our entire self” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74). In the language of Religion, a healthy self-regard is mechanical self-love, that is an extension of the predisposition to animality in the human being. It is a kind of self-concern for which no reason is required, but it is not immune to the plentitude of vices, including gluttony, lust, and “wild lawlessness” (Religion 6:26-27). But mechanical self-love is entirely different from the malignant self-regard that is self-conceit, which, in conflict with the moral law, arrogantly “prescribes the subjective conditions of [self-love] as laws” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74).

So, while the moral agent recognizes the requirements of the moral law and wishes to practice self-restraint by virtue of its normative requirements, the moral law is neither universally adopted nor gladly accepted in all cases and at all times. The fact that the moral law does not merely infringe “upon our self-conceit,” but “humiliates every human being when he compares with it the sensible propensity of his nature,” illustrates that this malignant condition is as unavoidable as it is universal (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74).

To return to the issue of radical evil in the Religion, human beings are generally susceptible to natural inclinations that never actually agree with the dictates of the moral law. Rather than naturally possessing a propensity to follow the moral law, humans instead possess a propensity to follow their own self-serving inclinations. Since, as we saw earlier, human beings are wholly good or evil by virtue of whether or not they choose a moral governing maxim or an egoistic alternative at the top of their hierarchy of maxims, this propensity must be evil and imputable to human nature.

4. Overcoming Evil: The Necessity of an Ethical-Religious Revolution

Although Kant, for the most part, dedicates only the first two chapters of the Religion to radical evil, he anticipates some of its issues in the Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (as heteronomy), in the Critique of Practical Reason, and in the Metaphysics of Morals. He dedicates the remaining two books of Religion to cultivating the idea of an ethical community which requires as a necessary condition for participation that an individual possesses a disposition transformed by a “revolution.” While the revolution may be characterized as a singular event, it is also the first step in a new life of unending progress toward goodness (Religion 6:67). Only through a revolution can an individual claim to have acquired a “holy will.”  The “Kingdom of God on earth,” or the ethical commonwealth, is composed of individuals who have recognized both this need for a revolution and the primacy of the moral law as their governing maxim (Religion 6:95 ff).

While radical evil must be understood in terms of a propensity that is as inexplicable as it is universal, it is nevertheless “imputed to us” as a disposition (Religion 6.43). How we come to choose a good disposition (and overcome evil), is equally unfathomable. The difficulty lies in the fact that acquiring such a disposition cannot merely be a matter of a resolution to try harder next time (though such resolve is of some merit). Nor is a mere change in the habitual practice of virtues sufficient by itself to acquire a good character because the disposition remains corrupted in the midst of such efforts. The only solution is to undergo a revolution in our “mode of thought” (Denkungsart; Religion 6:47). Acquiring an original goodness that constitutes “holiness of maxims” is the acquisition of a disposition in compliance with our duty to the maxim of obedience to the moral law and serves as the basis for our subsequent maxims (Religion 6:47). It should be noted that Kant’s use of ‘revolution’ should not be confused with a social or political revolution, since this would ultimately lead to the Terror witnessed in the French Revolution.

The acquisition of the holy disposition through such a revolution requires that we take up the disposition of the human personification of the holy will, present to us in our reason as the archetype of moral perfection. To elevate ourselves to this ideal of moral perfection constitutes our universal human duty (Religion 6:61-62). Kant identifies the historical human personification of this archetype as the “Son of God.” This individual is described in religious terms as the one who has “descended from Heaven,” whom we come to believe in through “practical faith.” When an agent acquires this disposition, then that agent, by emulating it, may be considered as “not an unworthy object of divine pleasure” (Religion 6:62). We are no longer subject to suffering the moral consequences of our own sin or debt. Yet we are nevertheless obliged to continue to experience the consequences of the life lived prior to the revolution (Religion 6:75n). Indeed, according to Kant, to undergo suffering as the consequence of a “pre-conversion” life is consistent with his views about the development of a good character (Religion 6:69).

The revolution, then, is not merely an intellectual undertaking. It also involves a practical and continual process of reformation of maxims in accordance with the newly acquired governing maxim of “holiness of maxims.” An intelligible (Denkungsart) revolution takes place when a human being makes a singular decision which instantaneously reverses “the supreme ground of his maxims” (Religion 6:48), and precedes a gradual empirical (Sinnesart) reformation of character. The former is the volitional overcoming of the propensity to evil that serves as a basis for maxim choice, a mode that is distinct from that of the empirical reformation (for Kant, they are in fact, two sides of the same coin). For, once an individual has experienced this inner revolution, “he is a good human being only in incessant laboring and becoming, i.e. he can hope –  in view of the purity of the principle –  to find himself upon the good (though narrow) path of constant progress from bad to better” (Religion 6:48).

The operative in question here is that of “manifestation of the good principle,” or “humanity in its moral perfection,” as displayed in the disposition of the Son of God in history (Religion 6:77). Our acquisition of a renewed disposition requires a kind of moral habituation. It is a disposition that results from adopting holiness of maxims as a governing maxim, and subsequently not only serves to systematically root out vice, but aids in the resolution to resist backsliding from temptation—because for Kant, ought implies can. It involves a commitment to the struggle to restructure one’s incentives from top to bottom, as it were, from self-conceit towards virtue; it is to begin to fulfill one’s duties from duty itself.

We may note that by means of this revolution, moral reform does carry with it a degree of uncertainty as to whether or not we will succeed. Hope for success rests on considering our efforts from the divine perspective. For, from this perspective, what matters is a change of heart, or the acquisition of a transformed moral disposition or character. Through such a change, Kant says, “in the sight of the divine judge for whom the disposition takes the place of the deed,” the agent is morally “another being” (Religion 6:74). Because one who has taken on the disposition of the archetype of humanity has become a new creation, the disposition of the personified archetype comes to be considered a kind of work “imputed to us by grace” (Religion 6:75-76). At the same time, Kant also appears to recognize that, in practical terms and from the human perspective, we might need reassurance that our efforts are successful.

On this matter, Kant appears to offer some consolation using the distinction between “narrow” and “perfect” duties on the one hand, and “wide” or “imperfect” duties on the other (Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, 4:424). Narrow or perfect duties clearly constitute tasks that we are required to do or accomplish and are therefore exact in their stipulation. On the other hand, a wide or imperfect duty is one such that, although we are required to strive for it, is not something that we can be expected to attain. Holiness of will is such a duty. For while holiness is narrow and perfect—and constitutes a qualitative ideal—practically considered, it can only be considered a wide duty “because of the frailty (fragilitas) of human nature.” That is: “It is a human being’s duty to strive for this perfection, but not to reach it . . . and his compliance with this duty can, accordingly consist only in continual progress” (The Metaphysics of Morals 6:446). Holiness of will is for us such an ideal, the fulfillment of which we cannot be certain of attaining in this lifetime

Kant’s account of radical evil as a propensity has received much discussion at the turn of the twenty-first century and has generated a fair degree of controversy. One criticism is that he does not allow for the possibility of diabolical evil. A second is that, while Kant is committed to holding that the propensity to evil is universal, his positions on the revolution fail to properly allow for the possibility of grace, the doctrine that God is able to act in human affairs and effect change within a person’s moral disposition. This paper does not attempt to adjudicate between these two concerns, and they do not affect the main thesis that for Kant, evil is largely a moral category, present universally in human beings as a propensity to self-conceit that influences the adoption of maxims.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary References

i. German

  • Immanuel Kant. Bereitstellung und Pflege von Kants Gesarmmelten Werken in elektronisher Form. 2008.
    • References and quotations in this encyclopedia article have used the English translation of Kant’s works provided by Cambridge University Press, but the textual references themselves are to Kant’s Gesarmmelten Werken that is available online.

ii. English

  • Kant, Immanuel. Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, trans. and ed. by M. J. Gregor. In Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Critique of Practical Reason, trans and ed. by M. J. Gregor. In Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Kant, Immanuel. The Metaphysics of Morals, trans. and ed. by M.J. Gregor. In The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Religion Within the Boundaries of Mere Reason. In Immanuel Kant: Religion and Rational Theology, trans. and ed. by A. W. Wood and G. diGiovanni. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

b. Secondary References

  • Allison, Henry. Kant’s Theory of Freedom. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
    • First to propose the Rigorism Thesis and Incorporation Thesis, and the propensity to evil as an intelligible act.
  • Allison, Henry. “On the Very Idea of a Propensity to Evil.” The Journal of Value Inquiry 36 (2002): 337-48.
    • Defends propensity to evil as intelligible act against Wood’s thesis that the propensity to evil is mere “unsociable sociality.” Many subsequent articles tend to defend either Allison or Wood.
  • Anderson-Gold, Sharon. “God and Community: An Inquiry into the Religious Implications of the Highest Good.” In Rossi and Wreen (1991), pp. 113-131.
    • An important contribution to the discussion on the significance of evil within Kant’s anthropology.
  • Anderson-Gold, Sharon. Unnecessary Evil. New York: State University of New York Press, 2001.
  • Anderson-Gold, Sharon, and Pablo Muchnik (eds). Kant’s Autonomy of Evil: Interpretive Essays and Contemporary Applications. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Caswell, Matthew. “Kant’s Conception of the Highest Good, the Gesinnung, and the Theory of Radical Evil.” Kant-Studien 97 (2006): 184-209.
    • Offers discussion on importance of the disposition for the acquisition of evil as an alternative incentive to the Good. Caswell largely follows Allison’s thesis.
  • Caswell, Matthew. “The Value of Humanity and Kant’s Conception of Evil.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 44.4 (2006): 635-63.
  • Fackenheim, Emil. “Kant and Radical Evil.” University of Toronto Quarterly 23 (1954): 339-53.
    • Raises questions about whether Kant’s apparent claim that each person is responsible for “self-redemption” is consistent within his Religion as a whole.
  • Grimm, Stephen. “Kant’s Argument for Radical Evil.” European Journal of Philosophy 10:2 (2002): 160-77.
    • By and large a defense of Wood’s position.
  • Kosch, Michelle. Freedom and Reason in Kant, Schelling, and Kierkegaard. Oxford/New York: Clarendon, 2006.
    • A discussion of Kant’s ethics of autonomy, and offers an account of the challenge faced by radical evil to Kant’s ethics of autonomy; for the most part follows Wood’s thesis against Allison.
  • Mariña, Jacqueline, “Kant on Grace: A Reply to His Critics.” Religious Studies 33 (1997): 379-400.
    • Presents a defense of Kant against Wolterstorf and Michalson for the compatibility of Kant’s Religion on the topic of the possibility of grace.
  • Matuštík, Martin Beck. Radical Evil and the Scarcity of Hope. Bloomington/ Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2008.
    • Chapter 8 offers contemporary criticism of Kant, largely following Silber, arguing that Kant’s account of evil is restricted by his commitment to resisting diabolical evil.
  • Michalson Jr., Gordon. Fallen Freedom. Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
    • While offering excellent commentary on Religion 1 & 2, critiques Kant’s treatment of grace and Christian theism generally.
  • Morgan, Seiriol. “The Missing Proof of Humanity’s Radical Evil in Kant’s Religion.” The Philosophical Review 114.1 (2005): 63-114.
    • Offers alternative proof for thesis that the propensity to evil is an intelligible act.
  • Muchnik, Pablo, “An Alternative Proof of the Universal Propensity to Evil.” In Sharon Anderson-Gold and Pablo Muchnik (2010), pp. 116-143.
    • Presents an alternative proof for evil as an innate propensity from Wood and Allison.
  • Quinn, Philip. “In Adam’s Fall, We Sinned All,” Philosophical Topics 16 (1988): 110-118.
    • Quinn was the first to present the propensity to evil, and its adoption by the disposition, understanding the disposition (Gesinnung) as the ‘meta-maxim’.
  • Quinn, Philip. “Saving Faith from Kant’s Remarkable Antinomy,” Faith and Philosophy 7.4 (1990): 418-433.
  • Reath, Andrews. “Kant’s Theory of Moral Sensibility: Respect for the Moral Law and the Influence of Inclination,” in his Agency and Autonomy in Kant’s Moral Theory, Oxford: Clarendon (2006), pp. 8-32.
  • Provides an excellent analysis of the importance in understanding respect as an incentive for the moral law.
  • Rossi, Philip J. and Michael J. Wreen. Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1991.
  • Savage, Denis. “Kant’s Rejection of Divine Revelation and his Theory of Radical Evil.” Rossi and Wreen (1991), pp. 54-76.
    • Presents skepticism of Kant’s willingness to allow for revelation in his Religion.
  • Silber, John. “The Ethical Significance of Kant’s Religion.” In Immanuel Kant, Religion Within  the Limits of Reason Alone. Trans. T.M. Greene and H.H. Hudson, New York: Harper and Row, 1960.
  • Silber’s introduction raises questions about the viability of Kant’s treatment of evil, given that it does not allow for the possibility of diabolical evil.
  • Silber, John. “Kant at Auschwitz.” Proceedings of the Sixth International Kant Congress. Ed. by G. Funke and T. Seebohm, Center of Advanced Research in Phenomenology and Research: University Press of America, 1991.
    • A defense of his earlier claim (1960), that Kant’s account of radical evil does not do justice to instances of diabolical evil in the twentieth century.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. “Conundrums in Kant’s Rational Religion.” In Rossi and Wreen (1991), pp. 40-53.
    • Raises questions about whether or not Kant’s Religion is consistent with Christian theism.
  • Wood, Allen. Kant’s Moral Religion. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 1970.
    • A discussion of Wood’s earlier views on Kant’s religion.
  • Wood, Allen. Kant’s Ethical Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
    • Chapter 9 develops his views of radical evil in terms of unsociable sociality against Allison.
  • Wood, Allen. “Kant and the Intelligibility of Evil.” In Sharon Anderson-Gold and Pablo Muchnik (2010), pp. 144-172.
    • Makes extensive use of Kant’s Anthropology for a defense of his thesis of radical evil as unsociable sociality, implicitly against Allison.


Author Information

Erik M. Hanson
University of Colorado
U. S. A.

Platonism and Theism

This article explores the compatibility of, and relationship between, the Platonic and Theistic metaphysical visions. According to Platonism, there is a realm of necessarily existing abstract objects comprising a framework of reality beyond the material world. Platonism argues these abstract objects do not originate with creative divine activity. Traditional Theism contends that God is primarily the creator and that God is the source of existence for all realities beyond himself, including the realm of abstract objects.

A primary obstacle between these two perspectives centers upon the origin, nature and existence of abstract objects.  The Platonist contends that these abstract objects exist as a part of the framework of reality and that abstract objects are, by nature, necessary, eternal and uncreated.  These qualities stand as challenges for the Traditional Theist, attempting to reconcile his or her metaphysic with that of Platonism since Traditional Theism contends that God is uniquely necessary, eternal, uncaused, and is the cause of everything that exists. The question, therefore, emerges as to whether these two metaphysical visions are reconcilable and, if not, then why not, and, if so, then how might this be accomplished?

Despite the differences, some Traditional Theists have found Platonism to be a helpful framework by which to convey their conclusions regarding the nature of God and of ultimate reality. Others pursue reconciliation between Theism and Platonism through the proposal of what has been defined as a modalized Platonism, which concludes that necessarily existing abstract objects, nevertheless, have origin in the creative activity of God.  Still others refuse any consideration of Theism in relationship to Platonism.

Table of Contents

  1. The Problem
  2. Platonism and Abstract Objects
    1. Abstract Objects and Necessary Existence
    2. Abstract Objects as Uncreated
    3. Abstract Objects as Eternal
  3. Traditional Theism
    1. God as Creator
    2. Creatio ex Nihilo
    3. Divine Freedom
  4. Emerging Tensions
    1. God as the Origin of Abstract Objects
    2. Abstract Objects as Uncreated
  5. Selected Proposals
    1. James Ross: A Critical Rejection of Platonism
    2. Nicholas Wolterstorff: A Restrictive Idea of Creation
    3. Morris and Menzel: Theistic Activism
    4. Bergman and Brower: Truthmaker Theory
    5. Plantinga: Christian Platonism
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Books
    2. Articles

1. The Problem

Is the platonic metaphysical vision compatible with that of Traditional Theism? Some would contend that the two are compatible, while others would argue to the contrary. Platonists argue that at least some, if not all, abstract objects are uncreated, and exist necessarily and eternally; whereas Traditional Theism asserts that God exists as the uncreated creator of all reality existing beyond himself.

But can this central conclusion of Traditional Theism be reconciled with the Platonic understanding of abstract objects as uncreated, necessarily extant, and eternal? Furthermore, if it is possible to reconcile these worldviews, how might one do so?  Put differently, is there anything, other than himself, that God has not created? Or are we to understand the conclusion that God has created everything in a qualified or restricted sense? Are there things which are not to be included in the Theistic tenet of faith that God is the creator of all things? If so, what things do not result from God’s creative activity?

2. Platonism and Abstract Objects

Contemporary Platonism argues the existence of abstract objects. Abstract objects do not exist in space or time and are entirely non-physical and non-mental. Contemporary Platonism, while deriving from the teachings of Plato, is not directly reflective of the teachings of Plato. Abstract objects are non-physical entities in that they do not exist in the physical world, and they are not compositionally material. Abstract objects are non-mental, meaning that they are not minds or ideas in minds, neither are they disembodied souls or gods. Further, abstract objects are said to be causally inert. In short, Platonism contends that abstract objects exist necessarily, are eternal, and cannot be involved in cause and effect relationships with other objects.

Platonists argue the existence of abstract objects since it makes sense to believe, for instance, that numbers exist and that the only legitimate view of these things is that they are abstract objects. For Platonists, however, there are several categories of things, including physical things, mental things, spiritual things, and the problematic fourth category that includes things such as universals (the wisdom of Socrates, the redness of an apple), relationships (for example, loving, betweenness), propositions (such as 7 + 5 = 12, God is just), and mathematical objects such as numbers and sets. (Menzel, 2001, 3)

As we shall see below, the existence of abstract objects represents a significant challenge for the Christian in particular and for Traditional Theists in general since it is central to these worldviews that God is the creator of everything other than God himself. Generally, however, abstract objects are considered to be like God in that they are said to have always existed, and to always exist in future. Consequently, there is no point at which God is considered to have brought them into being. (Menzel, 2001, 1-5).

But why would the Platonist conclude that God has not created all abstract objects, or has created selected abstract objects?  The response to this question moves us to a consideration of the nature of abstract objects as necessarily extant, uncreated, and eternal, and to briefly address why God’s creation of abstract objects is questionable.

a. Abstract Objects and Necessary Existence

What is meant by the phrase necessary existence? A thing is said to possess necessary existence if it would have existed no matter what or if it would have existed under any possible circumstances. A thing has necessary existence if its non-existence is impossible. For instance, if x is a necessary being, then the non-existence of x is as impossible as a round square or a liquid wine bottle. Human beings are said not to exist necessarily since we would never have existed if our parents had never met and this is a possible circumstance. (Van Inwagen, 1993, 118)

For the Platonist, God’s creation of abstract objects is questionable since they are understood to exist necessarily. As such, abstract objects cannot have not existed.  Consequently, consider whether God can create something existing necessarily? Put differently, does the assertion “x exists necessarily” entail that “x is uncreated”?  If this constitutes a valid assumption, the Platonic understanding of the nature of abstracts objects as necessarily extant excludes the creation of these objects by God or any other external source.

b. Abstract Objects as Uncreated

Second, for the Platonist, God’s creation of abstract objects is questionable since the creative event in Traditional Theism is understood to be a causal event and Platonism understands abstract objects as being uncreated and also as being incapable of entering into causal relations. If, therefore, abstract objects are uncreated, then it seems that God is just one more extant entity existing in the universe and God cannot be the maker of all things, both visible and invisible. (Menzel, 1986)

c. Abstract Objects as Eternal

Third, for the Platonist, God’s creation of abstract objects is questionable due to their being eternal. There is no point at which God could be said to have brought abstract objects into being and, therefore, it is difficult to think of them as creatures since they are not created. If an abstract object has no beginning in time there could not have been a time at which God first created it. (Menzel, 2001, 4-6) If abstract objects are eternal, then they possess a character which parallels God, since according to Traditional Theism God is considered to be eternal.

These platonic affirmations regarding the nature of abstract objects as eternal, necessary and uncreated pose significant challenges to any effort to merge the worldviews of Platonism and Traditional Theism. With this understanding of abstract objects, we now turn to a consideration of the definition of Traditional Theism.

3. Traditional Theism

What are the central tenets of Traditional Theism? First, Traditional Theism and Classical Theism (hereafter referred to as Traditional Theism) are regarded as synonymous. Traditional Theism is supported in the writings of authors such as Moses Maimonides (1135-1204), the Islamic author Avicenna (980-1037), and the Christian author Thomas Aquinas (1224-74). Traditional Theism constitutes what all Jews, Christians and Muslims officially endorsed for many centuries. In addition, Traditional Theists strongly endorse the aseity-sovereignty doctrine, according to which God is the uncreated Creator of all things and all things other than God depend upon God, while God depends on nothing whatsoever. (Davies, 2004, 1) Numerous philosophers have assumed that God is as defenders of Traditional Theism consider him to be, the source of all reality external to himself. From the period of St. Augustine of Hippo (354-430) to the time of G. W. Leibniz (1646-1716), philosophers carried on with the assumption that belief in God is belief in Traditional Theism. This understanding has been endorsed by many theologians, and is represented in the tenets of the Roman Catholic Church. These beliefs were also endorsed and propagated by many of the major Protestant reformers, such as the eighteenth century American Puritan, Jonathan Edwards.

It is to the definition of Traditional Theism that we turn since it is these tenets of faith that represent the primary obstacles in our effort to reconcile the Theistic and Platonic metaphysical perspectives. These include: God as creator, Creation as ex nihilo, and the assertion of divine freedom.

a. God as Creator

Traditional Theism understands God to be the creative source for his own existence, as well as for the existence of all reality existing outside of himself. First, as regards God’s being the creative source for his own existence, if something else created God, and then God created the universe, it would seem to most that this other thing was the real and ultimate source of the universe and that God is nothing more than an intermediary. (Leftow, 1990, 584) Therefore, according to Traditional Theism, there can be no regress of explanations for what exists past the explanations for God’s existence.

Second, Traditional Theism not only endorses the belief that God is responsible for his own existence, but also that God is the Creator of all extant reality beyond himself. Consequently, God is essentially what accounts for the existence of anything beyond God or God is responsible for the existence of something rather than nothing. For Traditional Theism, this notion entails not only that God is responsible for the fact that the universe began to exist, but that God’s work is also responsible for the continued existence of the cosmos. (Davies, 2004, 3)

b. Creatio ex Nihilo

Is there anything that can pre-exist the creative activity of God? Traditional Theists respond to this question with a resounding, “No.”  Aquinas writes,

We must consider not only the emanation of a particular being from a particular agent, but also the emanation of all being from the universal cause, which is God; and this emanation we designate by the name of creation. Now what proceeds by particular emanation is not presupposed to that emanation; as when a man is generated, he was not before, but man is made from not-man, and white from not-white. Hence, if the emanation of the whole universal being from the first principle be considered, it is impossible that any being should be presupposed before this emanation. For nothing is the same as no being. Therefore, as the generation of a man is from the not-being which is not-man, so creation, which is the emanation of all being, is from the not-being which is nothing. (Thomas Aquinas, 1948, Ia, 45, 1.)

Traditional Theism, therefore, understands God as the one who creates ex nihilo, or from nothing. The phrase denotes not that God, in the creative act, worked with something called “nothing” but that God creates that which is external to himself without there being anything prior to his creative act with the exception of himself. The challenging implication of this tenet of Traditional Theism for the Platonic notion of abstract objects is obvious. Traditional Theists counter the Platonic notion that abstract objects are uncreated, contending that if God did not create non-substance items, such as abstract objects, creation would not truly be ex nihilo, since these entities would have accompanied God from all eternity and become aspects of God’s creation, for example, by being unsubstantiated. (Leftow, 1990, 583-84).

c. Divine Freedom

Traditional Theists also argue that God’s choices to act are always carried out in the context of divine freedom, signifying that God is not constrained by anything beyond the laws of logic and His own nature. This is regarded as true by the Traditional Theist since God has established these laws and can alter them if he chooses to do so. Further, God cannot be compelled to choose. If God makes choices in response to human action, so says the Traditional Theist, it is always in his power to prevent actions by any method he chooses.

In short, God always responds to the actions he permits. Consequently, God is always ultimately in control, even in the context of actions that we have created. Therefore, if God carried out his creative activity in the context of complete divine freedom and if God is not and cannot be compelled to act creatively by any external source, then how can God’s freedom be reconciled with the Platonic notion of abstract objects as existing necessarily, since, if abstract objects exist necessarily by God’s creative act, then God was compelled to create them by forces beyond himself. Again, the tension between the two worldviews of Traditional Theism and Platonism becomes apparent.

As this examination of the central tenets of Traditional Theism demonstrates, a challenge exists in the effort to integrate the worldviews of Traditional Theism and Platonism. In summary, Platonists contend that abstract objects are uncreated, whereas Traditional Theists argue that God created all reality; Platonists believe that abstract objects exist necessarily, whereas Traditional Theists contend that God alone is necessarily extant; Platonists propose that abstract objects are eternal, whereas Traditional Theists believe that God alone is eternal. With these contrasts in mind, we turn now to consider specific problems said to emerge from them.

4. Emerging Tensions

As has been observed in this article, the apparent conflict between Platonism and Traditional Theism emerges from the central notion of Traditional Theism, that God is the absolute creator of everything existing distinct from himself; and the central claim of contemporary Platonism, that there exists a realm of necessarily existent abstract objects that could not fail to exist. In considering the tension between abstract objects and Traditional Theism, Gould writes,

To see what the problem is, consider the following three jointly inconsistent claims: (a) there is an infinite realm of abstract objects which are (i) necessary independent beings and are thus (ii) uncreated; (b) only God exists as a necessary independent being; (c) God creates all of reality distinct from him, i.e. only God is uncreated. Statement (a) represents a common understanding of Platonism. Statements (b) and (c) follow from the common theistic claim that to qualify for the title “God,” someone must exist entirely from himself (a se), whereas everything else must be somehow dependent upon him. (Gould, 2010, 2)

A contradiction emerges in consideration of the first and third claims. Proposal (a) posits the existence of abstract objects that are necessary, independent and uncreated. Proposal (c) posits that all reality existing separately from God has its origin in divine creative activity. These two proposals would appear to be mutually exclusive. As a result a rapprochement appears to exist between Platonism and Traditional Theism. Platonism asserts that the existence of all things outside of God is rooted in divine activity. Platonism further argues that there are strong reasons for recognizing in our ontology the existence of a realm of necessarily existent abstract objects. In contradistinction, the Traditional Theist claims that the realm of necessity as well as that of contingency is within the province of divine creation. For the Traditional Theist, therefore, God is, in some fashion, responsible for the existence of all necessarily existent entities, as well as for contingent objects such as stars, planets and electrons, and so forth. (Morris and Menzel, 1986, 153)

But what are the specific problems associated with the effort to merge Platonism and Traditional Theism? Menzel clarifies,

On the [P]latonist conception, most, if not all, abstract objects are thought to exist necessarily. One can either locate these entities outside the scope of God’s creative activity or not. If the former, then it seems the believer must compromise his view of God: rather than the sovereign creator and lord of all things visible and invisible, God turns out to be just one more entity among many in a vast constellation of necessary beings existing independently of his creative power. If the latter, the believer is faced with the problem of what it could possibly mean for God to create an object that is both necessary and abstract. (Menzel, 1987, 1)

Therefore, both horns of this dilemma lead to inevitable challenges. To contend that God created abstract objects has been said to lead to a problem of coherence and a questioning of divine freedom. To contend that God did not create abstract objects has been understood to lead to a problem regarding the sovereignty of God, as well as the uniqueness of God. It is to these matters that we now turn.

a. God as the Origin of Abstract Objects

Consider the conclusion that God created abstract objects. Two objections arise from this proposal.

First, the coherence problem contends that it makes no sense to discuss the origin of things considered to exist necessarily, or that could not have failed to exist, such as abstract objects. (Leftow, 1990, 584)  Supposing that at least some abstract objects exist necessarily, does the truth of this conclusion entail also that God has not created such abstract objects that exist of necessity?

Second, the freedom problem has its origin in the contention of Traditional Theism that God always acts in total freedom. However, if abstract objects exist necessarily, then God had no choice in the matter of their creation. Therefore, God is constrained by something other than himself, a conclusion leading to questions regarding the nature of God as omnipotent and possessing complete freedom. Traditional Theists are quick to affirm that God’s intentions or choices are not constrained by any entity other than God and no chain of true explanations goes beyond a divine intention or choice – or else beyond God’s having his nature and whatever beliefs he has logically before he creates, which may explain certain of God’s intentions and choices. For if nothing other than God forces God to act as he does, the real explanation of God’s actions always lies within God himself. (Leftow, 1990, 584-585)

b. Abstract Objects as Uncreated

Suppose, on the other hand, that God did not create abstract objects. Problems still emerge.  First, if God did not create abstract objects, and if abstract objects are eternal, necessary and uncreated, then these realities are sovereign, as is God who also is eternal, necessary and uncreated, according to the Traditional Theist. God therefore is merely one more object in the vast array of items in the universe, which also includes abstract objects. This dilemma has been designated as the sovereignty problem. (Leftow, 1990, 584)

Further, a necessary object is said to constitute its own reason for existence. It is said to exist of and from itself. Therefore there is no need for a further explanation of the reason for the existence of the necessary object, a belief known as the doctrine of aseity. Aseity, however, has been associated uniquely with God. Therefore, if abstract objects exist a se, then God is not unique, exists alongside abstract objects and, exists as one being among many others existing by their own nature. This problem has been designated as the uniqueness problem.

In consideration of the relationship of Platonism and Traditional Theism, these problems force the Theist to revise, in some fashion, his understanding of the nature of God, reject Platonism altogether, or to seek a manner in which to reconcile the two. We now turn to a consideration of certain of the efforts made by Traditional Theists to merge or reconcile these two major metaphysical perspectives.

5. Selected Proposals

Can the worldviews of Traditional Theism and Platonism be merged in a manner that does not compromise the core tenets of these seemingly divergent metaphysical perspectives? Proposals range from those which reject altogether the notion of compatibility to those that use the Augustinian notion of abstract ideas as products of the intellectual activity of God. The present section considers five prominent proposals.

a. James Ross: A Critical Rejection of Platonism

Ross’ approach represents a rejection of the integration of Platonic and Theistic metaphysical perspectives. Ross presents a highly critical analysis of Platonism. He denies the Platonic notion of the world of eternal forms, opting instead for a thorough-going Aristotelianism, positing the existence of inherent explanatory structures throughout reality, which he understands as “forms”.  According to Ross, if the independent necessary beings of Platonic Theism are other than God, both the simplicity and independence of God are compromised. Ross further posits that by attracting our attention to the Platonic abstractions, which all existing things are supposed to exemplify, we are consequently distracted from the things or objects themselves. (Ross, 1989, 3)

Ross presents a further set of objections to Platonic metaphysics. He points out that the whole set of abstract entities, which all physical objects are supposed to instantiate, are held to be eternal and changeless realities. Within a Theistic point of view, two options exist regarding these abstract entities according to Ross. First, some Theists propose that abstract entities are co-eternal with God because they are in fact one with God, and second, abstract objects are in some other sense ideas in the mind of God and therefore co-eternal with him.

Ross objects that the first possibility is incompatible with an attribute traditionally ascribed to God, that is, God’s simplicity. Ross further objects that the second contention compromises the Traditional Theists’ understanding of God as the source of all extant realities beyond himself.  Third, Ross counters that the divine creation seems not to involve much creativity or choice if it consists completely of God instantiating beings that had already existed for all of eternity, thereby compromising God’s freedom. Further, the whole sense of creatio ex nihilo is, therefore, eliminated if we are to conceive of God as not making things up but only granting physical existence to that which already shared abstract existence co-eternally with him. (Ross, 1989, 3-5)

Ross concludes that there is an inherent incompatibility of Platonism and Traditional Theism since the incorporation of the Platonic worldview, which entails the existence of abstract objects that exist eternally, necessarily, and are uncaused, forces the Traditional Theist to compromise in some fashion his understanding of the nature of God, thereby leading the Theist to a departure from what is regarded as an orthodox understanding of the nature of God.

b. Nicholas Wolterstorff: A Restrictive Idea of Creation

Nicholas Wolterstorff finds a mediating position between the Platonic and Theistic worldviews. He does so, however, by adopting a non-Traditional Theistic perspective, which according to some is an unavoidable consequence of endorsing Platonism. Wolterstorff proposes that necessarily existing abstract objects are in fact not dependent upon God. (Wolterstorff, 1970) and he promotes the view that some properties, specifically those exemplified by God, are to be excluded from God’s creative activity. (Gould, 2010, 134) Wolterstorff goes so far as to propose that God in his nature has properties that he did not bring about. (Wolterstorff, 1970, 292) He writes:

[Consider] the fact that propositions have the property of being either true or false. This property is not a property of God. . . . For the propositions “God exists” and “God is able to create” exemplify being true or false wholly apart from any creative activity on God’s part; in fact, creative ability on his part presupposes that these propositions are true, and thus presupposes that there exists such a property as being either true of false. (Wolterstorff, 1970, 292; Gould, 2010, 135)

As such, Wolterstorff presents what may be termed a restrictive understanding of the creative activity of God. (Wolterstorff, 1970, 292). Wolterstorff, a Christian, argues that the biblical writers simply did not endorse a wide scope reading of the doctrine of creation. He posits that it cannot legitimately be entertained that the biblical writers actually had universals in view when speaking of God’s being the Creator of all things. In addition, he points out that the creator/creature distinction is invoked in Scripture for religious and not theoretical or metaphysical reasons.

Again we see in Wolterstorff’s approach what those who reject Traditional Theism altogether understand to be an inevitable result of endorsing Platonism. Wolterstorff, due to his endorsing of Platonism, is said therefore to have compromised the understanding of Traditional Theism in that God ceases to be the creator of various dimensions of his own identity, as well as of objects existing beyond himself.

c. Morris and Menzel: Theistic Activism

Christopher Menzel and Thomas Morris acknowledge a tension between Theism and Platonism, but seek to reconcile the divergent metaphysical perspectives utilizing the concept of Theistic Activism. Morris and Menzel ask whether God can not only be responsible for the creation of all contingent reality, but also if it can be intelligently and coherently concluded that God can also be creatively responsible for necessary existence and necessary truth. Morris and Menzel proceed to demonstrate what they term as the extraordinary compatibility of core elements of the Platonic and Theistic metaphysical visions. (Morris and Menzel, 1986, 361). Menzel writes,

The model that will be adopted . . . is simply an updated and refined version of Augustine’s doctrine of divine ideas, a view I will call theistic activism, or just activism, for short. Very briefly, the idea is this. On this model, abstract objects are taken to be contents of a certain kind of divine intellective activity in which God is essentially engaged; roughly, they are God’s thoughts, concepts, and perhaps certain other products of God’s mental life. This divine activity is. . . causally efficacious: the abstract objects that exist at any given moment, as products of God’s mental life, exist because God is thinking them; which is just to say that he creates them. (Menzel, 1986)

The authors, therefore, attempt to provide a Theistic ontology which places God at the center and which views everything else as exemplifying a relation of creaturely dependence on God. The authors agree that Platonism, in general, has been viewed historically as incompatible with Western Theism, but they propose that this perceived incompatibility is not insurmountable, and that the notion of Theistic Activism can overcome this apparent incompatibility. Menzel and Morris have two consequent objectives. First, they strive to eliminate the apparent inconsistency between Platonism and Theism. Second, the authors strive to preserve the Platonic notions of abstract objects, such as properties as necessary beings, as eternal, and as uncreated.

Morris and Menzel resolve the tension between abstract objects existing in simultaneity with God, concluding that God, in some fashion, must be creatively responsible for abstract objects. The authors therefore advance Theistic Activism, suggesting that the origination for the framework of reality that includes abstract objects has its source in the divine intellectual activity.

First, they argue that a Theistic Activist will hold God creatively responsible for the entire modal economy, for what is possible as well as what is necessary, and even for what is impossible. As stated above, the authors resort to the Augustinian divine ideas tradition, which concludes that the Platonic framework of reality arises out of the creatively efficacious intellective activity of God. The authors contend that the entire Platonic realm is, therefore, to be understood as deriving from God (Morris and Menzel, 1986, 356).

Second, Morris and Menzel proceed to propose a continuous model of creation, according to which God is always playing a direct causal role in the existence of his creatures and his creative activity is essential to a creatures being at all times, throughout its spacio-temporal existence. This is true regardless of whether God initially causes the created entity to exist. This conclusion is essential to the proposal of Morris and Menzel in that it provides a framework in which it can coherently be argued that God creates absolutely all objects, be they necessary or contingent. (Menzel, 1982, 2)

Third, for the Theistic Activist, God is understood to necessarily create the framework of reality. Morris and Menzel acknowledge the potentially problematic nature of this contention with regard to the activity of God as a free creator. As a resolution to the dilemma posed by the notions of God necessarily creating and God’s freedom, the authors argue that divine freedom must be understood in a radically different fashion from human freedom. Divine freedom is shaped by God’s moral nature. Therefore, God could not have done morally otherwise than was conducted in the act of creation.

Fourth, Morris and Menzel also address the problem of God’s own nature in relationship to this creative activity. The authors give consideration to the question of whether the varied dimensions of God’s own nature are part of the creative framework. The authors have two responses. They reject the proposal of some that God is to be understood as pure being and therefore devoid of determinate attributes such as omnipotence or omniscience. Morris and Menzel opt for the solution that God has a nature and that God creates his own nature. (Morris, 1989)

The writers conclude:

On the view of absolute creation, God is indeed a determinate, existent individual, but one whose status is clearly not just that of one more item in the inventory of reality. He is rather the source of absolutely everything there is: to use Tillich’s own characterization, he is in the deepest sense possible the ground of all-being. (Morris and Menzel, 1986, 360)

d. Bergman and Brower: Truthmaker Theory

Bergman and Brower conclude that Platonism is inconsistent with the central thesis of Traditional Theism, the aseity-dependence doctrine, which holds that God is an absolutely independent being who exists entirely from himself or a se. This central thesis of Traditional Theism led both philosophers and theologians of the Middle Ages to endorse the doctrine of divine simplicity by which God is understood to be an absolutely simple being, completely devoid of any metaphysical complexity. Further, according to the doctrine, God lacks the complexity associated with material or temporal composition, as well as the minimal form of complexity associated with the exemplification of properties.

The inconsistency is most apparent with regard to the tension between Platonism and divine simplicity. Platonism requires all true predications to be explained in terms of properties. Divine simplicity requires God to be identical with each of the things that can be predicated of him. If both are true, then God is identical with each of his properties and is therefore himself a property. This conclusion stands in contrast with the Traditional Theists understanding of God as a person and the conclusion that persons cannot be exemplified. Therefore Bergman and Brower advance that Platonism is inconsistent with the aseity-dependence doctrine itself. They further argue that the rejection of divine simplicity fails to remove this tension. In their conclusion, contemporary philosophers of religion have lost sight of a significant tension existing between Traditional Theism and Platonism, concluding that the two are perfectly compatible.

Bergman and Brower describe Platonism as characterized by two components. They remind that Platonism entails the view that a unified account of predication can be provided in terms of properties or exemplifiables. They also point out that Platonism entails the view that exemplifiables are best conceived of as abstract objects. Bergman and Brower indicate that Traditional Theism has typically addressed the second of these views and they propose that the distinctive aspect of their own argument targets the first. For Bergman and Brower this distinction is all important since it is often concluded that the inconsistency of Platonism and Traditional Theism is avoided merely by rejecting the Platonic view of properties in favor of another, such as the Augustinian view that properties are ideas in the mind of God. They write,

Traditional Theists who are Platonists, therefore, cannot avoid the inconsistency merely by dropping the Platonic conception of properties and replacing it with another – whether it be an Aristotelian conception (according to which there are no unexemplified universals), some form of immanent realism (according to which universals are concrete constituents of things that exemplify them), a nominalistic theory of tropes (according to which properties are concrete individuals), or even the Augustinian account (according to which all exemplifiables are divine concepts). (Bergman and Brower, 2006, 3-4)

However, Bergman and Brower contend that the inconsistency between the two metaphysical perspectives remains as long as the Traditional Theist continues to endorse the second of the two components of Platonism cited above. They further argue that the inconsistency can be resolved in only one of two ways. Either one is compelled to reject Traditional Theism and, therefore, become either a non-Theist or a non-Traditional Theist, or one is compelled to reject any unified account of predication in terms of exemplifiables. Those who desire to maintain the perspective of Traditional Theism are naturally inclined to adopt a unified account of predication and it is at this point that Bergman and Brower propose the alternative of Truthmaker Theory. (Bergman and Brower, 2006, 4)

But what is intended with the designation Truthmaker? The authors point out that the designation is not to be understood in causal terms or literally in terms of a “maker”, but on the contrary it is to be understood in terms of what they regard as a broadly logical entailment. Bergman and Brower begin their defense of Truthmaker Theory with a defense of the Truthmaker Theory of predication. Twenty-first century philosophers typically speak of Truthmakers as entailing the truth of certain statements or as predication by which is intended the truths expressed by them. For instance:

TM: If an entity E is a Truthmaker for a predication P, then “E exists” entails the truth expressed by P.

As a result, Socrates may be regarded as the Truthmaker for the statement “Socrates is human,” and God may be regarded as the Truthmaker for the statement, “God is divine.” If Traditional Theists desire to explain the truth of this predication in terms of something other than properties or exemplifiables, they can do so in terms of Truthmakers since, given that “God is divine” is a case of essential predication and that God necessitates its truth, God is, therefore, a plausible candidate for its Truthmaker. (Bergman and Bower, 2006, 25-27)

Not only do Bergman and Brower defend a Truthmaker Theory of predication, but they also attempt to demonstrate that Truthmaker Theory yields an understanding of the doctrine of divine simplicity that rescues the doctrine from the standard contemporary objection leveled against it, its alleged lack of coherence. Therefore, from the fact that God is simple, the medievals infer that God lacks any accidental or contingent properties and therefore that all true predications of the form “God is F” are cases of essential predication. Therefore, from the truth, “God is divine” it can be inferred that God is identical with his nature or divinity, which conclusion redeems the doctrine of divine simplicity. From the truth “God is good,” it can be inferred that he is identical with his goodness, the essence of the doctrine of divine simplicity. This is true for every other predication of this nature. Further, it can be concluded that just as God is identical with each of these qualities, so also each of these qualities is identical with each of the others, a further component of the doctrine of divine simplicity.

e. Plantinga: Christian Platonism

Alvin Plantinga has been described as a Platonist par–excellence. (Gould, 2010, 108) If Platonism is defined as the metaphysical perspective that there are innumerably many necessarily existing abstract entities, then Plantinga’s Does God Have A Nature? represents a thorough defense of Christian Platonism. (Freddoso, 145-53) Plantinga acknowledges that most Christians believe that God is the uncreated creator of all things and all things depend on him, and he depends upon nothing at all. The created universe presents no problem for this doctrine. God’s creation is dependent on him in a variety of ways and God is in no way dependent upon it. However, what does present a problem for this doctrine is the entire realm of Platonic universals, properties, kinds, propositions, numbers, sets, states of affairs and possible worlds. These things are everlasting, having no beginning or end. Abstract objects are also said to exist necessarily. Their non-existence is impossible. But how then are these abstract objects related to God? Plantinga frames the problem:

According to Augustine, God created everything distinct from him; did he then create these things? Presumably not; they have no beginnings. Are they dependent on him? But how could a thing whose non-existence is impossible . . . depend upon anything for its existence? And what about the characteristics and properties these things display? Does God just find them constituted the way they are? Must he simply put up with their being thus constituted? Are these things, their existence and their character, outside his control?  (Plantinga, 1980, 3-4)

Plantinga acknowledges two conflicting perceptions regarding God and he attempts to reconcile these two perspectives. On the one hand, it is argued that God has control over all things (sovereignty) and we believe that God is uncreated or that God exists a se.  Second, it is argued that certain abstract objects and necessary truths are independent of God and that certain of these, such as omniscience, omnipotence, omni-benevolence, constitute God’s nature. These two conclusions, however, are logically contradictory. How can God have sovereign control over all things and abstract objects exist independently?

Either the first or the second of these intuitions must be false. The entirety of Does God Have A Nature? is dedicated to an attempt to resolve this dilemma. Plantinga first discusses the proposal of Kant. Kant resolved the problem of these two conflicting intuitions through the denial that God has a nature, a conclusion that Plantinga rejects. Plantinga then moves to the consideration of the proposed solution of Thomas Aquinas. Aquinas argues on behalf of the doctrine of divine simplicity, which posits that God has a nature, but that God is identical with his nature. Plantinga concludes that Aquinas’ proposal is also inadequate due to the implications of the doctrine of divine simplicity, which seems to be problematic in that it leads to the denial of the personhood of God, thereby reducing him to an abstract object. Plantinga then turns to nominalism. The nominalist contends that abstract objects, such as properties, do not exist in any real sense. Abstract objects, therefore, are nothing more than designations and do not refer to any objects. Nominalism fails, in Plantinga’s opinion, since it is irrelevant to the real issue, the preservation of God’s absolute control. Plantinga then contends, in light of the failure of the previous approaches, that we may resolve to deny the truth of our intuition that abstract objects are necessary, or eternal, a conclusion which is designated as universal possibilism since the implication of the position is that everything is possible for God, a notion which Plantinga also rejects, since, in his opinion, this conclusion simply seems absurd.

However, for Plantinga the bifurcation between the Theistic notion of God as the uncreated creator of all that exists outside of himself and the Platonic notion of the existence of abstract objects, which exist necessarily and eternally, is not insurmountable. Plantinga endorses a form of Platonic realism. He espouses a conception of properties according to which these abstract objects are a specific type of abstract entity, namely, universals. Plantinga, proposes the following solution to the dilemma,

Augustine saw in Plato a vir sapientissimus et eruditissimus (Contra Academicos III, 17); yet he felt obliged to transform Plato’s theory of ideas in such a way that these abstract objects become . . . part of God, perhaps identical with his intellect. It is easy to see why Augustine took such a course, and easy to see why most later medieval thinkers adopted similar views. For the alternative seems to limit God in an important way; the existence and necessity of these things distinct from him seems incompatible with his sovereignty. (Plantinga, 1980, 5)

Plantinga, therefore, concludes that there may be some sense of dependence between God and abstract objects, that these abstract objects depend on God asymmetrically, and that they are the result of God’s intellective activity.

From the preceding overview we see that there exists a tension between the central notion of Traditional Theism, that God exists as the uncreated creator and that all objects existing beyond God have the source of their being in the creative activity of God, and the central notion of Platonism, that there exists a realm of abstract objects which are uncreated, and exist necessarily and eternally. Furthermore, we have seen that there exists a variety of proposals ranging from those that reject altogether the notion that these two distinctive worldviews are reconcilable, to those that would argue on behalf of their compatibility. (Freddosso, 1983)

6. References and Further Reading

a. Books

  • Aquinas, T. (1948). Summa Theologiae, trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. U.S.A: Christian Classics.
  • Brown, C. (1968). Philosophy and the Christian Faith. Illinois: Intervarsity Press.
    • Provides an examination of the historical interaction of philosophical thought and Christian theology.
  • Campbell, K. (1990). Abstract Particulars. Basil Blackwell Ltd.
    • Provides an in-depth analysis of Abstract Particulars.
  • Davies, B. (2004) An Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion (3rd ed.). New York: Oxford University Press.
    • An excellent introduction to the basic issues in Philosophy of Religion.
  • Gerson, L. P. (1990). Plotinus: The Arguments of the Philosophers. New York: Routledge.
    • Provides an analysis of the development of Platonic philosophy and its incorporation into Christian Theology.
  • Morris, T. (1989) Anselmian Explorations: Essays in Philosophical Theology. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Plantinga, A. (1980). Does God Have a Nature? Milwaukee, Wisconsin: Marquette University Press.
    • Discusses the relationship of God to abstract objects.
  • Plantinga, A. (2000). Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Explores the intellectual validity of Christian faith.
  • Van Inwagen, P. (1993) Metaphysics. Westview Press.
    • An in-depth exploration of the dimensions of metaphysics.
  • Wolterstorff, N. (1970). On Universals: An Essay in Ontology. University of Chicago.
    • Explores the nature of Platonic thought, the tenets of Traditional Theism.

b. Articles

  • Bergman, M., Brower, J. E. (2006). “A Theistic Argument against Platonism.” Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, 2, 357-386.
    • Discusses the logical inconsistency between Theism and Platonism by virtue of the aseity dependence doctrine.
  • Brower, J. E. “Making Sense of Divine Simplicity.” Unpublished.
    • Presents an in-depth analysis of the nature of divine simplicity.
  • Freddoso, A. (1983). “Review of Plantinga’s ‘Does God Have a Nature?’.” Christian Scholars Review, 12, 78-83.
    • An excellent and helpful review of Plantinga’s most significant work.
  • Gould, P. (2010). “A Defense of Platonic Theism: Dissertation.” Purdue University West.
    • A defense of Platonic Theism, which seeks to remain faithful to the Theistic tradition.
  • Leftow, B. (1990). “Is God an Abstract Object?.” Nous, 24, 581-598.
    • Strives to demonstrate that the Identity Thesis follows from a basic Theistic belief.
  • Menzel, C. (2001). “God and Mathematical Objects.” Bradley, J., Howell, R. (Eds.). Mathematics in a Postmodern Age: A Christian Perspective. Eerdman’s.
  • Menzel, C. (1987). “Theism, Platonism, and the Metaphysics of Mathematics.” Faith and Philosophy, 4(4), 1-22.
  • Morris, T., Menzel, C. (1986). “Absolute Creation.” American philosophical quarterly, 23, 353-362.
    • Seeks to reconcile the divergent metaphysical perspectives utilizing the concept of Theistic Activism
  • Plantinga, A. (1982). “How to be an Anti-Realist.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 56 (1), 47-70.
    • An insightful and helpful discussion of Plantinga’s rejection of contemporary anti-realism and unbridled realism.
  • Ross, J. (1989). “The Crash of Modal Metaphysics.” Review of Metaphysics, 43, 251-79.
    • Addresses Quantified Modal Logic as at one time promising for metaphysics.
  • Ross, J. (1983). Creation II. “In The Existence and Nature of God.” A. J. Freddoso, (Ed). Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Van Inwagen, P. (2009). “God and Other Uncreated Things.” Timpe, K. (Ed). Metaphysics and God: Essays in Honor of Eleonore Stump, 3-20.
    • Addresses the question regarding whether there is anything other than himself that God has not created.
  • Van Inwagen, P. (1988). “A Theory of Properties.” Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, 1, 107-138.
    • Explores the rationality of belief in abstract objects in general and properties in particular.


Author Information

Eddy Carder
Prairie View A & M University
U. S. A.

Immanuel Kant: Philosophy of Religion

Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) focused on elements of the philosophy of religion for about half a century─from the mid-1750s, when he started teaching philosophy, until after his retirement from academia.  Having been reared in a distinctively religious environment, he remained concerned about the place of religious belief in human thought and action.  As he moved towards the development of his own original philosophical system in his pre-critical period through the years in which he was writing each Critique and subsequent works all the way to the incomplete, fragmentary Opus Postumum of his old age, his attention to religious faith was an enduring theme.  His discussions of God and religion represent a measure of the evolution of his philosophical worldview.  This began with his pre-critical advocacy of the rationalism in which he was educated.  Then this got subjected to the systematic critique that would open the doors to his own unique critical treatment.  Finally, at the end of his life, he seemed to experiment with a more radical approach.  As we follow the trajectory of this development, we see Kant moving from confidently advocating a demonstrative argument for the God of metaphysics to denying all theoretical knowledge of a theological sort, to affirming a moral argument establishing religious belief as rational, to suspicions regarding religion divorced from morality, and finally to hints of an idea of God so identified with moral duty as to be immanent rather than transcendent.  The key text representing the revolutionary move from his pre-critical, rationalistic Christian orthodoxy to his critical position (that could later lead to those suggestions of heterodox religious belief) is his seminal Critique of Pure Reason.  In the preface to its second edition, in one of the most famous sentences he ever wrote, he sets the theme for this radical transition by writing, “I have therefore found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith” (Critique, B).  Though never a skeptic (for example, he was always committed to scientific knowledge), Kant came to limit knowledge to objects of possible experience and to regard ideas of metaphysics (including theology) as matters of rational faith.

Table of Contents

  1. Kant and Religion
  2. God in Some Pre-critical Writings
  3. Each Critique as Pivotal
    1. The First Critique
    2. The Second Critique
    3. The Third Critique
  4. The Prolegomena and Kant’s Lectures
    1. The Prolegomena
    2. Kant’s Lectures
  5. Other Important Works
  6. His Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone
  7. Some Tantalizing Suggestions from the Opus Postumum
  8. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Kant and Religion

This article does not present a full biography of Kant. A more general account of his life can be found in the article Kant’s Aesthetics.  But five matters should be briefly addressed as background for discussing his philosophical theology:  (1) his association with Pietism; (2) his wish to strike a reasonable balance between (the Christian) religion and (Newtonian physical) science; (3) his attempt to steer a middle path between the excesses of dogmatic modern rationalism and skeptical modern empiricism; (4) his commitment to the Enlightenment ideals; and (5) his unpleasant encounter with the Prussian censor over his religious writings.

Kant was born, raised, educated, worked, lived, and died in Königsberg (now Kaliningrad, part of Russia), the capital city of East Prussia.  His parents followed the Pietist movement in German Lutheranism, as he was brought up to do.  Pietism stressed studying the scriptures as a basis for personal devotion, lay governance of the church, the conscientious practice of Christian ethics, religious education emphasizing the development and exercising of values, and preaching designed to inculcate and promote piety in its adherents.  At the age of eight, the boy was sent to a Pietist school directed by his family’s pastor.  Eight years later, he enrolled in the University of Königsberg, where he came under the influence of a Pietist professor of logic and metaphysics.  Even during later decades of his life, when he ceased to practice religion publicly (see letter to Lavater in Correspondence, pp. 152-154) and found external displays of pious devotion distasteful, his thought and values continued to be influenced by the Pietism of his earlier years.

Second, as a university student, Kant became a follower of Newtonian science.  The dissertation for his graduate degree was more what we would consider physics than philosophy, although in those days it was called “natural philosophy.”  Many of his earliest writings were in Newtonian science, including his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens of 1755 (in Cosmogony), dedicated to his king, Frederick the Great, and propounding a nebular hypothesis to explain the formation of our solar system.  He had reason to worry that his thoroughly mechanistic explanation might run afoul of Biblical fundamentalists who advocated the traditional doctrine of strict creationism.  This is illustrative of a tension with which he had to deal all of his adult life—regarding how to reconcile Christian faith and scientific knowledge—which his philosophy of religion would address.

Third, although this is a bit of an oversimplification, before Kant, modern European philosophy was generally split into two rival camps:  the Continental Rationalists, following Descartes, subscribed to a theory of a priori innate ideas that provide a basis for universal and necessary knowledge, while the British Empiricists, following Locke, subscribed to a tabula rasa theory, denying innate ideas and maintaining that our knowledge must ultimately be based on sense experience.  This split vitally affected views regarding knowledge of God.  Descartes and his followers were convinced that a priori knowledge of the existence of God, as an infinitely perfect Being, was possible and favored (what Kant would later call) the Ontological Argument as a way to establish it.  By contrast, Locke and his followers spurned such a priori reasoning and resorted to empirical approaches, such as the Cosmological Argument and the Teleological Arguments or Design Arguments.  An important Continental Rationalist was the German Leibniz, whose philosophy was systematized by Christian Wolff; in the eighteenth century, the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy was replacing scholasticism in German universities.  Kant’s family pastor and the professor who was so important in his education were both significantly influenced by Wolff’s philosophy, so that their young student was easily drawn into that orbit.  But he also came to study British Empiricists and was particularly disturbed by the challenges posed by the skeptical David Hume, which would gradually undermine his attachment to rationalism.  A vital feature of Kant’s mature philosophy is his attempt to work out a synthesis of these two great rival approaches.

Fourth, the eighteenth century was the heyday of the intellectual movement of the Enlightenment in Europe (as well as in North America), which was committed to ideals that Kant would appropriate as his own—including those of reason, experience, science, liberty, and progress.  Frederick II, who was the Prussian king for most of Kant’s adult life (from 1740 to 1786) was called both “Frederick the Great” and “the Enlightenment King.”  Hume and Wolff were both Enlightenment philosophers, as was Kant himself, who published a sort of manifesto for the movement, called “What Is Enlightenment?” (1784). There he calls his an age of developing enlightenment, though not yet a fully enlightened age.  He champions the cause of the free use of reason in public discussion, including freedom from censorship regarding publishing on religion (Essays, pp. 41-46).

Fifth, Kant himself faced a personal crisis when the Prussian government condemned his published book, Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone.  As long as Frederick the Great, “the Enlightenment King,” ruled, Kant and other Prussian scholars had broad latitude to publish controversial religious ideas in an intellectual atmosphere of general tolerance.  But Frederick was succeeded by his illiberal nephew, Frederick William II, who appointed a former preacher named Wöllner as his reactionary minister of spiritual affairs.  The anti-Enlightenment Wöllner issued edicts forbidding any deviations from orthodox Biblical doctrines and requiring approval by official state censors, prior to publication, for all works dealing with religion.  Kant managed to get the first book of his Religion cleared by one of Wöllner’s censors in Berlin.  But he was denied permission to publish Book II, which was seen as violating orthodox Biblical doctrines.  Having publicly espoused the right of scholars to publish even controversial ideas, Kant sought and got permission from the philosophical faculty at Jena (which also had that authority) to publish the second, third, and fourth books of his Religion and proceeded to do so.  When Wöllner found out about it, he was furious and sent Kant a letter, which he had written and signed, on behalf of the king, censuring Kant and threatening him with harsh consequences, should he ever repeat the offense.  Kant wrote a reply to the king, promising, “as your Majesty’s most loyal subject,” to refrain from all further public discussion of religion.  Until that king died (in 1797), Kant kept his promise.  But, as he later explained (Theology, pp. 239-243), that carefully worded qualifying phrase meant that the commitment would pass with that king, after whose death Kant, in fact, did resume publishing on religion.

2. God in Some Pre-critical Writings

Kant’s pre-critical writings are those that precede his Inaugural Dissertation of 1770, which marked his assumption of the chair in logic and metaphysics at the university.  These writings reflect a general commitment to the Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalist tradition.  Near the beginning of his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens of 1755, Kant observes that the harmonious order of the universe points to its divinely governing first Cause; near the end of it, he writes that even now the universe is permeated by the divine energy of an omnipotent Deity (Cosmogony, pp. 14 and 153).  In his New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge (of the same year), he points to God’s existence as the necessary condition of all possibility (Exposition, pp. 224-225).

In The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God of 1763, after warning his readers that any attempt at proving divine reality will plunge us into the “dark ocean without coasts and without lighthouses” that is metaphysics, he develops that line of argumentation towards God as the unconditioned condition of all possibility.  He denies the Cartesian thesis that existence is a predicate, thus undermining modern versions of the Ontological Argument.  The absolutely necessary Being that is the ground of all possibility must be one, simple, immutable, eternal, the highest reality, and a spirit, he argues.  He analyzes possible theoretical proofs of God into four possible sorts.  Two of these—the Ontological, which he rejects, and his own—are based on possibility; the other two—the Cosmological and the Teleological (Design), both of which he deems inconclusive—are empirical.  The final sentence of the book maintains that, though we must be convinced of God’s existence, logically demonstrating it is not required (Basis, pp. 43, 45, 57, 69, 71, 79, 81, 83, 87, 223, 225, 229, 231, and 239).  That same year, Kant also published his Enquiry concerning the Clarity of the Principles of Natural Theology and Ethics.  Here, while still expressing doubts that any metaphysical system of knowledge has yet been achieved, he nevertheless maintains his confidence that rational argumentation can lead to metaphysical knowledge, including that of God, as the absolutely necessary Being (Writings, pp. 14, 25, and 29-30).  What we see in these pre-critical writings is the stamp of Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalism, but also the developing influence of Hume, whom Kant was surely studying during this period.

3. Each Critique as Pivotal

The heart of Kant’s philosophical system is the triad of books constituting his great critiques:  his Critique of Pure Reason, published in 1781 (the A edition), with a significantly revised second edition appearing in 1787 (the B edition); his Critique of Practical Reason, published in 1788; and his Critique of Judgment, published in 1790.

a. The First Critique

Though some key ideas of the Critique of Pure Reason were adumbrated in Kant’s Inaugural Dissertation of 1770 (in Writings), this first Critique is revolutionary in the sense that, because of it, the history of philosophy became radically different from what it had been before its publication.  We cannot adequately explore all of the game-changing details of the epistemology (theory of knowledge) he develops there, which has been discussed elsewhere in the IEP (see “Immanuel Kant: Metaphysics”), but will only consider the elements that have a direct bearing on his philosophy of religion.

The monumental breakthrough of this book is Kant’s invention of the transcendental method in philosophy, which allows him to discover a middle path between modern rationalism, which attributes intellectual intuition (for example, innate ideas) to humans, enabling them to have universal and necessary factual knowledge, and modern empiricism, which maintains that we only have sensible intuition, making it difficult to see how we can ever achieve universal and necessary factual knowledge through reason.  Kant argues that both sides are partly correct and partly mistaken.  He agrees with the empiricists that all human factual knowledge begins with sensible intuition (which is the only sort we have), but avoids the skeptical conclusions to which this leads them by agreeing with the rationalists that we bring something a priori to the knowing process, while rejecting their dogmatic assumption that it must be the innate ideas of intellectual intuition.  According to Kant, universal and necessary factual knowledge requires both sensible experience, providing its content, and a priori structures of the mind, providing its form.  Either without the other is insufficient.  He famously writes, “Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (Critique, A51/B75).  Without empirical, sensible content, there is nothing for us to know; but without those a priori structures, we have no way of giving intelligible form to whatever content we may have.

The transcendental method seeks the necessary a priori conditions of experience, of knowledge, and of metaphysical speculation.  The two a priori forms of sensibility are time and space:  that is, for us to make sense of them, all objects of sensation, whether external or internal, must be temporally organizable and all objects of external sensation must also be spatially organizable.  But time and space are only forms of experience and not objects of experience, and they can only be known to apply to objects of sensible intuition.  When sensory inputs are received by us and spatio-temporally organized, the a priori necessary condition of our having objective knowledge is that one or more of twelve concepts of the understanding, also called “categories,” must be applied to our spatio-temporal representations.  These twelve categories include reality, unity, substance, causality, and existence.  Again, none of them is an object of experience; rather, they are all categories of the human mind, necessary for our knowing any objects of experience.  And, again, they can only be known to apply to objects of sensible intuition.  Now, by its very nature, metaphysics (including theology) necessarily speculates about ultimate reality that is not given to sensible intuition and therefore transcends any and all human perceptual experience.  It is a fact of human experience that we do engage in metaphysical speculation.  So what are the transcendental conditions of our capacity to do so?  Kant’s answer is that they are the three a priori ideas of pure reason—the self or soul, the cosmos or universe as an orderly whole, and God, the one of direct concern to us here.  But, as we never can have sensible experience of objects corresponding to such transcendent ideas and as the concepts of the understanding, without which human knowledge is impossible, can only be known to apply to objects of possible experience, knowledge of the soul, of the cosmos, and of God is impossible, in principle.

So what are we to make of ideas that can never yield knowledge?  Here Kant makes another innovative contribution to epistemology.  He says that ideas can have two possible functions in human thinking.  Some (for example, empirical) ideas have a “constitutive” function, in that they can be used to constitute knowledge, while others have only a “regulative” function (Critique, A180/B222), in that, while they can never constitute knowledge, they do serve the heuristic purpose of regulating our thought and action.  This is related to Kant’s dualistic distinction between the aspect of reality that comprises all phenomenal appearances and that which involves our noumenal ideas of things-in-themselves.  (Although it is important, we cannot here explore this distinction in the depth it deserves.)  Because metaphysical ideas are unknowable, they cannot serve any “constitutive” function.  Still, they have great “regulative” value for both our thinking and our voluntary choices.  They are relevant to our value-commitments, including those of a religious sort.  Three such regulative ideas are Kant’s postulates of practical reason, which are “God, freedom, and immortality” (Critique, A3/B7).  Although none of them refers to an object of empirical knowledge, he maintains that it is reasonable for us to postulate them as matters of rational faith.  This sort of belief, which is subjectively, but not objectively, justifiable, is a middle ground between certain knowledge, which is objectively, as well as subjectively, justified, and mere arbitrary opinion, which is not even subjectively justified (Critique, A822/B850).  Such rational belief can be religious—namely, faith in God.

Kant presents four logical puzzles that he calls “antinomies” to establish the natural  dialectical illusions that our reason inevitably encounters when it engages metaphysical questions about cosmology in an open-minded fashion.  The fourth of these particularly concerns us here, as reason purports to be able to prove both that there must be an absolutely necessary Being and that no such Being can exist.  His dualism can expose this apparent contradiction as bogus, maintaining that in the realm of phenomenal appearances, everything exists contingently, with no necessary Being, but that in the realm of noumenal things-in-themselves there can be such a necessary Being.

But, we might wonder, what about the traditional arguments for God?  If even one of them proves logically conclusive, would not that constitute some sort of knowledge of God?  Here we encounter yet another great passage in the first Critique, where Kant’s epistemology leads him to a trenchant undermining of all such arguments.  He maintains that there is a trichotomy of types of speculative arguments for God:  the “physico-theological” Argument from Design, various Cosmological Arguments, and the non-empirical "Ontological" Argument.  He cleverly shows that the first of these, even if it worked, would only establish a relatively intelligent and powerful architect of the world and not a necessarily existing Creator.  In order to establish it as a necessary Being, some version of the second approach is needed.  But, if that worked, it would still fail to show that the necessary creator is an infinitely perfect Being, worthy of religious devotion.  Only the Ontological Argument will suffice to establish that.  But here the problems accumulate.  The Ontological Argument fails because it tries to attribute infinite, necessary existence to God; but existence, far from being a real predicate of anything, is merely a concept of the human understanding.  Then the cosmological arguments also fail, in trying to establish that God is the necessary ultimate cause of the world, for both causality and necessity are merely categories of human understanding.  Although Kant exhibits considerable respect for the teleological argument from design, in addition to its conclusion being so disappointingly limited, it also fails as a logical demonstration, in trying to show that an intelligent Designer must exist to account for the alleged intelligent design of the world. The problem is that we do not and cannot ever experience the world as a coherent whole, so that the argument’s premise is merely assumed without foundation.  Thus Kant undermines the entire project of any philosophical theology that pretends to establish any knowledge of God (Critique, A592/B620-A614/B642 and A620/B648-A636/B664).  Yet he remains a champion of religious faith as rationally justifiable.  So how can he make such a position philosophically credible?

b. The Second Critique

Here we must turn to his ingenious Critique of Practical Reason.  Although it is essentially a work of ethics, a significant part of it is devoted to establishing belief in God (as well as in the immortality of the soul) as a rationally justifiable postulate of practical reason, by means of what has come to be called his “moral argument.”  The argument hinges on his claim that we have a moral duty to help bring about, not just the supreme good of moral virtue, which we can achieve by our own efforts in this life, but also “the highest good,” which is  the “perfect” correlation of “happiness in exact proportion to morality.”  Since there cannot be any moral obligation that it is impossible to meet (“ought” implies “can”), achieving this highest good must be possible.  However, there is no reason to believe that it can ever be achieved by us alone, acting either individually or collectively, in this life.  So it would seem that all our efforts in this life cannot suffice to achieve the highest good.  Yet there must be such a sufficient condition, supernatural and with attributes far exceeding ours, identifiable with God, with whom we can collaborate in the achievement of the highest good, not merely here and now but in the hereafter.  Thus he establishes God and human immortality as “morally necessary” hypotheses, matters of “rational faith.”  This is also the basis of Kant’s idea of moral religion, which we shall discuss in more detail below.  But, for now, we can observe his definition of “religion” as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands.”  Thus the moral argument is not purely speculative but has a practical orientation.  Kant does not pretend that the moral argument is constitutive of any knowledge.  If he did, it could be easily refuted by denying that we have any obligation to achieve the highest good, because it is, for us, an impossible ideal.  The moral argument rather deals with God as a regulative idea that can be shown to be a matter of rational belief.  The famous sentence near the end of the second Critique provides a convenient bridge between it and the third:  “Two things fill the mind with ever new and increasing admiration and awe, the oftener and more steadily we reflect on them:  the starry heavens above me and the moral law within me” (Reason, pp. 114-115/AA V: 110-111, 126-130/AA V: 121-126, 134/AA V: 129-130, and 166/AA V: 161).  As morality leads Kant to God and religion, so does the awesome teleological order of the universe.

c. The Third Critique

Although Kant’s Critique of Judgment is also not essentially a work in the philosophy of religion, its long appendix contains an important section that is germane for our purposes.  We recall that, while criticizing the teleological argument from design, Kant exhibited a high regard for it.  Such physical teleology points to a somewhat intelligent and powerful designing cause of the world.  But now Kant pursues moral teleology, which will connect such a deity to our own practical purposes—not only to our natural desire for happiness, but to our moral worthiness to achieve it, which is a function of our own virtuous good will.  He gives us another version of his moral argument for God, conceived not as the amoral, impersonal metaphysical principle indicated by the teleological argument from design, but rather as a personal deity who is the moral legislator and governor of the world.  Again, all this points to God as a regulative matter of “moral faith,” without any pretense of establishing any theological knowledge (which would violate Kant’s own epistemology).  Such faith is inescapably doubtful, in that it remains reasonable to maintain some doubt regarding it, and a matter of trust in teleological ends towards which we should be striving.  Nor should we be so presumptuous as to suppose that we can ever comprehend God’s nature or purposes.  It is only by analogy that we can contemplate such matters at all (Judgment, pp. 295-338/AA II: 442-485), a point which Kant more carefully develops in his Prolegomena.

4. The Prolegomena and Kant’s Lectures

a. The Prolegomena

Most—but not all—of the religious epistemology that is of note in Kant’s Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics is already contained in his more philosophically impressive first Critique and will not be repeated here.  But a few pages of its “Conclusion” add something that we have not yet considered.  One of the abiding problems of the philosophy of religion is how we can speak (and even think) about God except in anthropomorphic human terms without resorting to an indeterminate fog of ineffable mysticism.  The great rationalists are particularly challenged here, and Hume, whom Kant credits with awaking him from his dogmatic slumbers, mercilessly exploits their dilemma.  Kant’s project continues to be to navigate a perilous middle path between the equally problematic approaches of anthropomorphism  and mysticism.  Kant appreciates the dilemma as acutely as Hume, but wants to solve it rather than merely highlighting it.  Hume means to replace theism with an indeterminate deism.  Kant, himself a theist, admits that Hume’s objections against theism are devastating but holds that his arguments undermine only attempted deistic proofs and not deistic beliefs.  Remembering that the concepts of the understanding cannot be known to apply to anything that transcends all possible experience, we can see that it will be a challenge for Kant to evade Hume’s dilemma.  His approach is to distinguish between a malignant “dogmatic anthropomorphism,” which tries literally to attribute to God natural qualities, such as those attributable to humans, and a more benign “symbolic anthropomorphism,” which merely draws an analogy between God’s relation to our world and relations among things in our world, while avoiding thinking of them as identical.  Kant’s example is helpful here:  while we have no possible natural knowledge of God’s love for us and should acknowledge that it cannot be identical to any (necessarily limited) human love, we can use analogical language to think and talk about God’s love for us—as the love of human parents is directed to the welfare of their children, so God’s love for us is directed to human well-being.  Thus, Kant maintains, we can avoid the vicious sort of dogmatic anthropomorphism which Hume rightly attacks and, for example, attribute to God a rational relationship to our world without pretending that divine reason is exactly the same as ours, for example, discursive and, thus, limited  (Prolegomena, pp. 5, 19, and 96-99).  Thinking and speaking of God with analogous language can facilitate a theology that neither is anthropomorphic in a bad way nor succumbs to the dialectical illusions from which Kant’s epistemology would save us.

b. Kant’s Lectures

A somewhat neglected, but still important, dimension of Kant’s philosophy of religion can be found in his Lectures on Philosophical Theology, which comprises an introduction, a first part on transcendental theology, and a second part on moral theology.  After maintaining that rational theology’s essential value is practical rather than speculative, he defines religion as “the application of theology to morality,” which is a bit broader than the definition of the second Critique but is in line with it.  He conceives of the God of rational theology as the causal author and moral ruler of the world.  He considers himself a theist rather than a deist because he is committed to a free and moral “living God,” holy and just, as well as omniscient and omnipotent, as a postulate of practical reason (Lectures, pp. 24, 26, 30, and 41-42).  In the first part of the Lectures, Kant considers the speculative proofs of God, as well as the use of analogous language as a hedge against gross anthropomorphism.  But, as we have already discussed the more famous treatments of these topics (in the first Critique and the Prolegomena, respectively), we can pass over these here.

The second part of the Lectures starts with a version of the moral argument, which we have already considered (in connection with its more famous treatment in the second Critique).  This line of reasoning leads to the moral attributes of “God as a holy lawgiver, a benevolent sustainer of the world, and a just judge.”  A major problem of the philosophy of religion we have yet to consider is the problem of evil.  If, indeed, an infinitely perfect and supremely moral God governs the world with divine providence, how can there be so much evil, in all its multiple forms, in that world?  More specifically, for Kant, how can moral evil be consistent with divine holiness, pain and suffering with divine benevolence, and morally undeserved well-being and the lack of it with divine justice?  Despite God’s holiness, moral evil is a function of our  free will as rational creatures and our responsibility for our own development.  Despite God’s benevolence towards personal creatures, the physical evils of pain and suffering provide incentives for our progressing towards fulfillment.  And, despite God’s justice, the disproportion between virtue and well-being in this life must be temporary, to be rectified hereafter (Lectures, pp. 112 and 115-121).  This earlier (from the 1780s) attempt at theodicy on Kant’s part was neither particularly original nor particularly convincing.

5. Other Important Works

Kant deals with the problem of evil more impressively in his “On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy” (1791).  He analyzes possible attempts at theodicy into three approaches:  (a) it can argue that what we consider evil actually is not, so that there is really no conflict; (b) it can argue that the conflict between evil and God is naturally necessitated; and (c) it can argue that evil, though contingent, is the result of someone other than God.  Kant’s own earlier work attempted to combine the second and third strategies; but here he concludes that all of these approaches must fail.  More specifically, attempts to show that there is no pernicious conflict between moral evil and God’s holiness,   between the physical evils of pain and suffering and God’s goodness,  and, finally, between the disproportion of happiness and misery to virtue and vice and God’s justice, all fail using all three approaches.  Thus Kant’s considered conclusion is negative:  the doubts that are legitimately raised by the evil in our world can neither be conclusively answered nor conclusively refute God’s infinite moral wisdom.  Thus, theodicy, like matters of religion more generally, turns out to be a matter of faith and not one of knowledge (Theology, pp. 24-34; see also “What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” in Theology pp. 12-15, and “Speculative Beginning of Human History,” in Essays).  In a work published the year he died, Kant analyzes the core of his theological doctrine into three articles of faith:  (1) he believes in one God, who is the causal source of all good in the world; (2) he believes in the possibility of harmonizing God’s purposes with our greatest good; and (3) he believes in human immortality as the necessary condition of our continued approach to the highest good possible (Metaphysics, p. 131).  All of these doctrines of faith can be rationally supported.  This leaves open the issue of whether further religious beliefs, drawn from revelation, can be added to this core.  As Kant makes clear in The Conflict of the Faculties, he does not deny that divinely revealed truths are possible, but only that they are knowable.  So, we might wonder, of what practical use is revelation if it cannot be an object of knowledge?  His answer is that, even if it can never constitute knowledge, it can serve the regulative function of edification—contributing to our moral improvement and adding motivation to our moral purposes (Theology, pp. 283 and 287-288).

6. His Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone

Kant’s Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone of 1793 is considered by some to be the most underrated book in the entire history of the philosophy of religion.  In a letter to a theologian, he subsequently repeats the questions with which he thinks any philosophical system should deal (three of them in his first Critique, A 805/B 833; see also his Logic, pp. 28-30, where he adds a fourth).  The first one, regarding human knowledge, had been covered in the first Critique and the Prolegomena; the second, regarding practical values, was considered in his various writings on ethics and socio-political philosophy; the fourth, regarding human nature, had been covered in his philosophical anthropology. Now,  with Religion, Kant addresses the third question of what we can reasonably hope for, and moves towards completing his system (Correspondence, pp. 458-459).  Thus we can conclude that Kant himself sees this book, the publication of which got him into trouble with the Prussian government, as crucial to his philosophical purposes.  Hence we should take it seriously here as representative of his own rational theology.  In his Preface to the first edition, he again points out that reflection on moral obligation should lead us to religion (Religion, pp. 3-6; see also Education, pp. 111-114, for his analysis of how religion should be taught to children).  In his Preface to the second edition, he offers an illuminating metaphor of two concentric circles—the inner one representing the core of the one religion of pure moral reason and the outer one representing many revealed historical religions, all of which should include and build on that core (Religion, p. 11).

In the first book, Kant considers our innate natural predisposition to good (in being animals, humans, and persons) and our equally innate propensity to evil (in our frailty, impurity, and wickedness).  Whether we end up being praiseworthy or blameworthy depends, not on our sensuous nature or our theoretical reason, but on the use we make of our free will, which is naturally oriented towards both good and evil.  There are two dimensions of what we call “will,” both of which are important in grasping Kant’s view here.  On the one hand, there is our capacity for free choice (his word is “Willkür”); on the other hand, there is practical reason as rationally legislating moral choice and action (“Wille”).  Thus a “good will” chooses in accordance with the rational demands of the moral law.  At any rate, we are born with a propensity to evil; but whether we become evil depends on our own free acts of will.  Thus Kant demythologizes the Christian doctrine of original sin.  He then distinguishes between the phony religion of mere worship designed to win favor for ourselves and the authentic moral religion of virtuous behavior.  Although it is legitimate to hope for God’s grace as helping us to lead morally good lives, it is mere fanaticism to imagine that we can become good by soliciting grace rather than freely choosing virtuous conduct (Religion, pp. 21-26, 30, 32, 35, and 47-49).

In the second book, Jesus of Nazareth is presented as an archetype symbolizing our ability to resist our propensity to evil and to approach the virtuous ideal of moral perfection.  What Kant does not say is whether or not, in addition to being a moral model whose example we should try to follow, Jesus is also of divine origin in some unique manner attested to by miracles.  Just as he neither denies nor affirms the divinity of Christ, so Kant avoids committing himself regarding belief in miracles, which can lead us into superstition (Religion, pp. 51, 54, 57, 74, 77, and 79-82; for more on the mystery of the Incarnation, see Theology, pp. 264-265).

In the third book, Kant expresses his rational hope for the ultimate supremacy of good over evil and the establishment of an ethical commonwealth of persons under a personal God, who is the divine law-giver and moral ruler—the ideal of the invisible church, as opposed to actual realities of visible churches.  Whereas statutory religion focuses on obedient external behavior, true religion concerns internal commitment (or good will).  Mere worship is a worthless substitute for good choices and virtuous conduct.  Here Kant makes a particularly provocative claim, that, ultimately, there is only “one (true) religion,” the religion of morality, while there can be various historical “faiths” promoting it.  From this perspective, Judaism, Islam, and the various denominations of Christianity are all legitimate faiths, to be located in Kant’s metaphorical outer circle, including the true religion of morality, his metaphorical inner circle.  However, some faiths can be relatively more adequate expressions of the religion of moral reason than others (Religion, pp. 86, 89-92, 95, and 97-98; see also Theology, pp. 262-265).

In his particularly inflammatory fourth book, Kant probes the distinction between legitimate religious service and the pseudo-service of religious clericalism.  From our human perspective, religion—both revealed and natural—should be regarded as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands.”  Kant embraces the position of “pure rationalist,” rather than naturalism (which denies divine revelation) or pure supernaturalism (which considers it necessary), in that he accepts the possibility of revelation but does not dogmatically regard it as necessary.  He acknowledges scripture scholars’ valuable role in helping to disseminate religious truth so long as they respect “universal human reason as the supremely commanding principle.”  Christianity is both a natural and a revealed religion, and Kant shows how the gospel of Matthew expresses Kantian ethics, with Jesus as its wise moral teacher.  Following his moral teachings is the means to true religious service, whereas substituting an attachment to external worship allegedly required instead of moral behavior is mere “pseudo-service.” Superstition and fanaticism are typical aspects of such illusions and substituting superstitious rituals for morally virtuous conduct  is mere “fetishism.”  Kant denounces clericalism as promoting such misguided pseudo-service.  The ideal of genuine godliness comprises a combination of fear of God and love of God, which should converge to help render us persons of morally good will.  So what about such religious practices as prayer, church attendance, and participation in sacraments?  They can be either good expressions of devotion, if they bind us together in moral community (occupying Kant’s inner circle) or bad expressions of mere pseudo-service, if designed to ingratiate us with God (an accretion to the outer circle not rooted in the inner circle of genuine moral commitment).  Mere external shows of piety must never be substituted for authentic inner virtue (Religion, pp. 142-143, 147-153, 156-158, 162, 165, 167-168, 170, and 181-189; cf. Ethics, pp. 78-116).  Kant’s Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone provides a capstone for the revolutionary treatment of religion associated with his critical philosophy.

7. Some Tantalizing Suggestions from the Opus Postumum

Yet it is quite admirable that, in the last few years of his life, despite struggling with the onset of dementia that made any such task increasingly challenging, he kept trying to explore new dimensions of the philosophy of religion.  As has already been admitted, the results, located in his fragmentary Opus Postumum, are more provocative than satisfying; yet they are nevertheless worthy of brief consideration here.  The work comprises a vast quantity of scattered remarks, many of which are familiar to readers of his earlier writings, but some of which represent acute, fresh insights, albeit none of them adequately developed.  Here again Kant  writes that reflection on moral duty, determinable by means of the categorical imperative, can reasonably lead us to the idea of God, as a rational moral agent with unlimited power over the realms of nature and of freedom, who prescribes our duties as divine commands.   He then adds a bold idea, which breaks with his own previous orthodox theological concept of a transcendent God.  Developing his old notion of God as “an ideal of human reason,” he identifies God with our concept of moral duty rather than as an independent substance.  This notion of an immanent God (that is, one internal to our world rather than transcendently separate from it), while not carefully worked out by Kant himself, would be developed by later German Idealists (most significantly, Hegel).  While conceding that we think of God as an omnipotent, omniscient, and omnibenevolent personal Being, Kant now denies that personality can be legitimately attributed to God—again stepping out of mainstream Judeo-Christian doctrine.  Also, rather than still postulating God as an independent reality, he here says that “God and the world are correlates,” interdependent and mutually implicating one another.  Unfortunately, we can only conjecture as to what, exactly, he means by this claim.  Referring to Spinoza (the most important pre-Kantian panentheist in modern philosophy), he pushes the point even more radically, writing, “I am in the highest being.”  But, then,   Kant goes on to condemn Spinoza’s panentheistic conception of God (that is, the view also found in  Hegel, that God contains our world rather than transcending it) as outlandish “enthusiastic” fanaticism. In fact, he suggests the inverse—instead of holding that we are in God, Kant now indicates that God is in us, though different from us,  in that God's reality is ideal rather than substantial.  He proceeds to maintain that not only God is infinite, but so are the world and rational freedom, identifying God with “the inner vital spirit of man in the world.”  Kant makes one final controversial claim  when he denies that a concept of God is even essential to religion (Opus, pp. 200-204, 210-211, 213-214, 225, 229, 231, 234-236, 239-240, and 248).  This denial is clearly not an aspect of Kant’s thought that is familiar and famous, and we should beware of presuming that we understand precisely what should be made of it.  But what is undeniable is what a long and soaring intellectual journey Kant made as he developed his ideas on God and religion from his pre-critical writings through the central, revolutionary works of his philosophical maturity and into the puzzling but tantalizing thought-experiments of his old age.

8. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Immanuel Kant, “An Answer to the Question:  What is Enlightenment?” trans. Ted Humphrey, in Essays.
  • Immanuel Kant, The Conflict of the Faculties, trans. Mary J. Gregor and Robert Anchor, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, Correspondence, trans. and edited by Arnulf Zweig.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Judgment, trans. J. H. Bernard (called “Judgment”).  New York: Hafner, 1968. References to this translation are accompanied by references to the Akademie Ausgabe Volume II.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Practical Reason, trans. Lewis White Beck (called “Reason”).  Indianapolis:  Bobbs-Merrill, 1956. References to this translation are accompanied by references to the Akademie Ausgabe Volume V.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, trans. Norman Kemp Smith (called Critique).  New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1965. References are to the A and B German editions.
  • Immanuel Kant, Education, trans. Annette Churton.  Ann Arbor:  University of Michigan Press, 1960.
  • Immanuel Kant, “The End of All Things,” trans. Allen W. Wood, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, Enquiry concerning the Clarity of the Principles of Natural Theology and Ethics, trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford, in Writings.
  • Immanuel Kant, Kant’s Cosmogony, trans. W. Hastie (called “Cosmogony”).  New York:  Garland, 1968.
  • Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Ethics, trans. Louis Infield (called “Ethics”).  New York:  Harper & Row, 1963.
  • Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Philosophical Theology, trans. Allen W. Wood and Gertrude M. Clark (called “Lectures”).  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1978.
  • Immanuel Kant, Logic, trans. Robert Hartman and Wolfgang Schwarz.  Indianapolis:  Bobbs-Merrill, 1974.
  • Immanuel Kant, New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge, trans. F. E. England (called “Exposition”), in England (below).
  • Immanuel Kant, On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and Intelligible World (Inaugural Dissertation), trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford, in Writings.
  • Immanuel Kant, “On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy,” trans. George di Giovanni, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God, trans. Gordon Treash (called “Basis”).  Lincoln:  University of Nebraska Press, 1994.
  • Immanuel Kant, Opus Postumum, edited by Eckart Förster and trans. Eckart Förster and Michael Rosen (called “Opus”).  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Immanuel Kant, Perpetual Peace and Other Essays, trans. Ted Humphrey (called “Essays”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1983.
  • Immanuel Kant, Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, trans. Paul Carus and revised by James W. Ellington (called “Prolegomena”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1977.
  • Immanuel Kant, Religion and Rational Theology, trans. and edited by Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (called “Theology”).  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Immanuel Kant, Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone, trans. Theodore M. Greene and Hoyt H. Hudson (called “Religion”).  New York:  Harper & Row, 1960.
  • Immanuel Kant, Selected Pre-Critical Writings and Correspondence with Beck, trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford (called “Writings”).  Manchester:  Manchester University Press, 1968.
  • Immanuel Kant, “Speculative Beginning of Human History,” trans. Ted Humphrey, in Essays.
  • Immanuel Kant, Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens, trans. W. Hastie, in Cosmogony.
  • Immanuel Kant, “What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?”, trans. Allen W. Wood, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, What Real Progress Has Metaphysics Made in Germany since the Time of Leibniz and Wolff?, trans. Ted Humphrey (called “Metaphysics”).  New York:  Abaris Books, 1983.

b. Secondary Sources

  • James Collins, The Emergence of Philosophy of Religion.  New Haven:  Yale University Press, 1967.
    • Chapters 3 through 5 deal with Kant’s philosophy of religion in a meticulous manner.
  • Frederick Copleston, S. J., A History of Philosophy, Volume 6.  Garden City:  Image Books, 1964.
    • Though old, this volume still represents exemplary Kant scholarship.
  • A. Hazard Dakin, “Kant and Religion," in The Heritage of Kant, edited by George Tapley Whitney and David F. Bowers.   New York:  Russell & Russell, 1962.
    • This is a non-technical critical analysis of Kant’s views on religion.
  • Michel Despland, Kant on History and Religion.  Montreal:  McGill-Queen’s University Press, 1973.
    • The second part of this book offers a detailed coverage of Kant’s philosophy of religion.
  • George di Giovanni, “Translator’s Introduction” to Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, in Theology, pp. 41-54.
    • This is an informative account of the history of Kant’s Religion.
  • S. Morris Engel, “Kant’s ‘Refutation’ of the Ontological Argument,” in Kant:  A Collection of Critical Essays, edited by Robert Paul Wolff.  Garden City:  Anchor Books, 1967.
    • This remains a provocative critical analysis of Kant’s critique of this argument.
  • F. E. England, Kant’s Conception of God.  New York:  Humanities Press, 1968.
    • This is a very good study of Kant’s development of a philosophy of religion.
  • Chris L. Firestone and Nathan Jacobs, In Defense of Kant’s Religion.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 2008.
    • This book cleverly presents criticisms of Kant’s views answered by defenses.
  • Chris L. Firestone and Stephen R. Palmquist, editors, Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 2006.
    • This is a good anthology of recent essays from both philosophical and theological perspectives.
  • Chris L. Firestone, “Making Sense Out of Tradition:  Theology and Conflict in Kant’s Philosophy of Religion,” in Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion, pp. 141-156.
    • This article does a good job of explaining Kant’s views on the proper roles of philosophers and theologians in dealing with religion.
  • Eckart Förster, Kant’s Final Synthesis:  An Essay on the Opus Postumum.  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 2000.
    • This is a close study of Kant’s final work.
  • Theodore M. Greene, “The Historical Context and Religious Significance of Kant’s Religion,” translator’s introduction to Religion.
    • This offers a long and still valuable perspective on Kant’s major work in the philosophy of religion.
  • Manfred Kuehn, Kant:  A Biography.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2001.
    • This is arguably the best intellectual biography of Kant in English.
  • G. E. Michalson, Jr., The Historical Dimensions of a Rational Faith:  The Role of History in Kant’s Religious Thought.  Washington, DC:  University Press of America, 1979.
    • This book relates Kant’s views on religion to his conception of history.
  • Stephen R. Palmquist, “Introduction” to Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason, trans. Werner S. Pluhar.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 2009.
    • This is a long and careful introduction to yet another translation of Kant’s most important book in the philosophy of religion.
  • Stephen R. Palmquist, Kant’s Critical Religion.  Aldershot, UK:  Ashgate, 2000.
    • This book explores its subject in astonishing detail.
  • Wayne P. Pomerleau, Western Philosophies of Religion.  New York:  Ardsley House, 1998.
    • The sixth chapter of this book is a detailed study of Kant’s philosophy of religion.
  • Bernard M. G. Reardon, Kant as Philosophical Theologian.  Totowa, NJ:  Barnes & Noble Books, 1988.
    • This fairly short book nevertheless develops a penetrating analysis of the subject.
  • Philip J. Rossi and Michael Wreen, editors, Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 1991.
    • This anthology contains some valuable essays on Kant’s theory.
  • Clement C. J. Webb, Kant’s Philosophy of Religion.  Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 1926.
    • This classic general treatment of this topic is still valuable.
  • Allen W. Wood, “General Introduction” to Theology, pp. xi-xxiv.
    • This is brief but, like all of Wood’s work on this subject, well done.
  • Allen W. Wood, “Kant’s Deism,” in Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered, pp. 1-21.
    • This is a provocative article considering the pros and cons of regarding Kant as a deist.
  • Allen W. Wood, Kant’s Moral Religion.  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1970.
    • This is an excellent treatment of Kant’s view of morality as the core of true religion.
  • Allen W. Wood, Kant’s Rational Theology.  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1978.
    • This book is more focused on Kant’s critique of speculative theology.
  • Allen W. Wood, “Rational Theology, Moral Faith, and Religion,” in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, edited by Paul Guyer.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • This essay offers an illuminating connection of important strands of Kant’s philosophy of religion.


Author Information

Wayne P. Pomerleau
Gonzaga University
U. S. A.


Omnipotence is the property of being all-powerful; it is one of the traditional divine attributes in Western conceptions of God. This notion of an all-powerful being is often claimed to be incoherent because a being who has the power to do anything would, for instance, have the power to draw a round square. However, it is absurd to suppose that any being, no matter how powerful, could draw a round square.  A common response to this objection is to assert that defenders of divine omnipotence never intended to claim that God could bring about logical absurdities. This observation about what is not meant by omnipotence does little, however, to clarify just what is meant by that term. Philosophers have therefore attempted to state necessary and sufficient conditions for omnipotence.

These proposed analyses are evaluated by several criteria. First, it must be determined whether the property described by the analysis captures what theologians and ordinary religious believers mean when they describe God as omnipotent, almighty, or all-powerful. Omnipotence is thought to be a quite impressive property. Indeed, the traditional God's omnipotence is one of the attributes that make Him worthy of worship. If, therefore, an analysis implies that certain conceivable beings who are not impressive with respect to their power count as omnipotent, then the analysis is inadequate.

Second, when a particular analysis does seem to be in line with the ordinary use of the term, the next question is whether the property described is self-consistent. For instance, many proposed analyses of omnipotence give inconsistent answers to the question of whether an omnipotent being could create a stone too heavy for it to lift. Third, it is necessary to determine whether omnipotence, so understood, could form part of a coherent total religious view. Some analyses of omnipotence require that an omnipotent being be able to do evil, or to break promises, but God has traditionally been regarded as unable to do these things. It has also been argued that the existence of an omnipotent being would be inconsistent with human freedom. Finally, divine omnipotence is one of the premises leading to the alleged contradiction in traditional religious belief known as the Logical Problem of Evil.

A successful analysis of omnipotence is one which captures the ordinary notion, is free from internal contradiction, and is compatible with the other elements of the religious view in which it is embedded.

Table of Contents

  1. The Self-Consistency of Omnipotence
    1. The Stone Paradox
    2. Voluntarism
    3. Act Theories
    4. Result Theories
    5. Omnipotence and Time
  2. Omnipotence and Necessary Moral Perfection
  3. Omnipotence and Human Freedom
  4. Omnipotence and the Problem of Evil
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Self-Consistency of Omnipotence

a. The Stone Paradox

Could an omnipotent being create a stone too heavy for it to lift? More generally, could an omnipotent being make something it could not control (Mackie 1955: 210)? This question is known as the Paradox of the Stone, or the Paradox of Omnipotence. It appears that answering either “yes” or “no” will mean that the being in question is not omnipotent after all. For suppose that the being cannot create the stone. Then it seems that it is not omnipotent, for there is something that it cannot do. But suppose the being can create the stone. Then, again, there is something it cannot do, namely, lift the stone it has created.

Although the argument is usually initially stated in this form, as it stands it is not quite valid. From the fact that a particular being is able to create a stone it cannot lift, it does not follow that there is in fact something that that being cannot do. It only follows that if the being were to create the stone, then there would be something it could not do. As a result, the paradox is a problem only for necessary omnitemporal omnipotence, that is, for the view that there is a being who exists necessarily and is necessarily omnipotent at every time (Swinburne 1973; Meierding 1980). There is no problem for a being who is only omnipotent at certain times, because the being in question might very well be omnipotent prior to creating the stone (but not after). Furthermore, the stone paradox provides no reason to suppose there could not be a contingently omnitemporally omnipotent being; all the being in question would need to do is to decide not to create the stone, and then it would be omnipotent at every time. Nevertheless, the Stone Paradox is of interest because necessary omnitemporal omnipotence has traditionally been attributed to God.

The Stone Paradox has been the main focus of those attempting to specify exactly what an omnipotent being could, and could not, do. However, even for those who do not wish to insist on necessary omnitemporal omnipotence, a number of questions arise. Could an omnipotent being draw a square circle? Descartes notoriously answered “yes.” However, the Western philosophical and theological traditions have, at least since Aquinas, almost universally given the opposite answer. The view that an omnipotent being could do absolutely anything, even the logically absurd, is known as voluntarism.

Simply rejecting voluntarism does not give an answer to the Stone Paradox. Creating a stone too heavy for its creator to lift is a possible task. Another possible task which an omnipotent being can apparently not perform is coming to know that one has never been omnipotent. For human beings, this is a fairly simple task, but for an omnipotent being it would seem to be impossible. The general problem is this: The fact that it is logically possible that some being perform a specified task (the task itself does not contain a contradiction) does not guarantee that it is logically possible for an omnipotent being to perform that task. Coming to know that one has never been omnipotent is an example of a single task that is logically possible for some being perform, but which is logically impossible for an omnipotent being to perform. The Stone Paradox provides an example of two tasks (creating a stone its creator cannot lift and lifting the stone one has just created) such that each task is logically possible, but it is logically impossible for one task to be performed immediately after the other.

In order to meet these challenges, it is necessary to say something more precise than to simply affirm that an omnipotent being would be able to do whatever is possible. These more precise theories can be divided into two classes: act theories, which say that an omnipotent being would be able to perform any action; and result theories, which say that an omnipotent being would be able to bring about any result.

b. Voluntarism

René Descartes, almost alone in the tradition of Western theology, held that God could do anything, even affirming that “God could have brought it about … that it was not true that twice four make eight” (Descartes 1984-1991: 2:294). If this doctrine is adopted, then the Stone Paradox is dissolved: If an omnipotent being could make contradictions true, then an omnipotent being could make a stone too heavy for it to lift and still lift it (Frankfurt 1964). However, this doctrine is of questionable coherence. To cite just one difficulty, it would seem to follow from the claim that God could make 2 x 4 = 9 that possibly God makes 2 x 4 = 9. However, it is a necessary truth that if God makes 2 x 4 = 9, then 2 x 4 = 9. In standard modal logics, possibly p and necessarily if p then q together entail possibly q, so it seems to follow that possibly 2 x 4 = 9.

Descartes does not accept this consequence, but it is not clear how he can avoid it. It has been suggested that he may be implicitly committed to the rejection of one or more widely accepted modal axioms (Curley 1984). These sorts of absurdities have led to the nearly universal rejection of voluntarism by philosophers and theologians.

c. Act Theories

Once voluntarism is rejected, it is necessary to specify more precisely what is meant by saying that an omnipotent being could do anything. One natural way of doing this is to give a definition of the form:

S is omnipotent =df S can perform any action A such that C

where C specifies some conditions A must satisfy. Such theories of omnipotence may be conveniently referred to as act theories. The simplest (non-voluntarist) act theory is:

(1) S is omnipotent =df S can perform any action A such that A is possible

This act theory deals with the problem of drawing a round square and making 2 x 4 = 9: these are not possible actions. There is some difficulty in saying exactly which acts should count as possible, and this threatens to make the condition too weak. For instance, a being who could perform only physically possible actions would not be omnipotent. The usual response, dating back at least to Aquinas, is to say that an action is possible, in the relevant sense, if and only if it consistent, that is, if it is not self-contradictory.

The Stone Paradox is most effective against act theories. Making a stone one cannot lift is a possible action, so, in order to count as omnipotent according to (1), a being must be able to perform it. However, if any being performs this task then there is a possible task which that being cannot perform immediately afterward, namely, lifting the stone one has just made. It might be objected that this task is not possible for the being in question, but this qualification is not permitted by (1). Definition (1) requires that an omnipotent being should be able to perform any logically possible action, that is, any action which could possibly be performed by any being at all, in any circumstances at all. It is clearly possible that some being perform the action lifting the stone one has just made, so, according to (1), a being who had just performed the action making a stone one cannot lift could not possibly be omnipotent.

This is not a problem for a being who is only contingently omnipotent: such a being might perform the first task, thereby ceasing to be omnipotent, and so be unable to perform the second task, or the being might refrain from performing the first task, and so continue to be omnipotent. However, the Paradox does show that on the contemplated theory no being could be necessarily omnitemporally omnipotent.

It has sometimes been thought that this problem could be solved simply by recognizing that creating a stone an omnipotent being cannot lift is an impossible action, and therefore an omnipotent being need not be able to perform it (Mavrodes 1963). However, this line of objection fails to recognize that, in addition to the impossible action creating a stone an omnipotent being cannot lift, there are also such possible actions as creating a stone one cannot lift and creating a stone its creator cannot lift.

There are further problems. Possible actions also include coming to know that one has never been omnipotent, which, since no one can know falsehoods, no omnipotent being could do. Additionally, this kind of view causes problems for various traditional religious views, such as the assertion by the author of the Epistle to the Hebrews that it is “impossible for God to lie” (Hebrews 6:18) since lying is a possible action.

Medieval philosophers prior to Aquinas often attempted to deal with this problem by claiming that an omnipotent being could perform any action which does not require a defect or infirmity. However, there was very little success in spelling out the meaning of this assertion (Ross 1969: 196-202). Here is a definition which cpatures the basic idea of these Medieval analyses:

(2)   S is omnipotent =df S can perform any action A such that it is logically possible that S does A.

This is similar to the Medieval suggestion since, according to classical theology, God is necessarily without defect or infirmity, so that, if the action A requires a defect or infirmity, (2) does not require that God, in order to count as omnipotent, should be able to do it. However, (2) runs into the famous 'McEar' counter-example (Plantinga 1967: 170; La Croix 1977: 183). Suppose that it is a necessary truth about a certain being, known as McEar, that the only action he performs is scratching his ear. It follows that, if McEar can scratch his ear, he is omnipotent, despite his inability to do anything else. This result is clearly unacceptable.

One response, considered by Alvin Plantinga and advocated by Richard La Croix, is to claim merely that an otherwise God-like being who satisfied this definition would be omnipotent. If the concept of God is otherwise coherent, then this claim is probably true. It also has the benefit of being guaranteed not to create any inconsistencies, for it is built into the definition that God has power only to perform those actions such that it is possible that he perform them. However, to adopt this strategy is to give up on the project of providing a general analysis of omnipotence. Furthermore, this claim, on its own, does not answer the question of the Stone Paradox: is it possible for God to create a stone he cannot lift?

Although not everyone agrees that La Croix's response is satisfactory, it is widely held that the prospects are not good for a consistent general definition or analysis of omnipotence in terms of acts (Ross 1969: 202-210; Geach 1973; Swinburne 1973; Sobel 2004: ch. 9).

d. Result Theories

The main alternatives to act theories of omnipotence are result theories, theories which analyze omnipotence in terms of the results an omnipotent being would be able to bring about. These results are usually thought of as states of affairs or possible worlds. A possible state of affairs is a way the world could be. Philosophers also sometimes recognize impossible states of affairs, that is, ways the world could not be. For instance, the sky's being blue is a possible state of affairs, and John's being a married bachelor is an impossible state of affairs. A possible world is a maximal consistent state of affairs, a complete way the world could be.

Equivalent, or approximately equivalent, result theories can be stated in terms either of states of affairs or of possible worlds. The simplest (non-voluntarist) result theory can be stated, in terms of possible worlds, as follows:

(3) S is omnipotent =df S can bring about any possible world

In other words, for any comprehensive way the world could be, an omnipotent being could bring it about that the world was that way. This account of omnipotence was first clearly laid out and endorsed by Leibniz, who pioneered the philosophical use of the notion of a possible world (Leibniz 1985: sects. 7-8, 52, 416). More recently, James Ross has advocated a similar account, though Ross prefers a formulation in terms of states of affairs (Ross 1969: 210-213):

(4) S is omnipotent =df for every contingent state of affairs p, whether p is the case is logically equivalent to the effective choice, by S, that p

Since every state of affairs must either obtain or not, and since two contradictory states of affairs cannot both obtain, an omnipotent being would have to will some maximal consistent set of contingent states of affairs (Ross 1980: 614), that is, some one possible world. Ross's definition therefore entails Leibniz's.

The Leibniz-Ross theory neatly handles all of the objections raised against act theories. First, the Stone Paradox depends on the existence of reflexive actions, that is, actions whose descriptions refer back to the actor. Although states of affairs can refer to agents, a state of affairs does not have an actor. Thus, the phrase 'there being a stone one cannot lift' fails to specify a state of affairs, since there is no actor for “one” to refer to. In order to specify a state of affairs, it is necessary to replace “one” with some expression that defines which agent or agents cannot lift the stone. However, there being a stone an omnipotent being cannot lift is clearly not a possible state of affairs. An omnipotent being could therefore not bring it about. On the other hand, there being a stone its creator cannot lift is a possible state of affairs, and could be brought about by an omnipotent being, under the Leibniz-Ross theory, for an omnipotent being could bring it about that some other being created a stone which that being could not lift. Therefore, the Stone Paradox is not a problem for the Leibniz-Ross theory.

The Leibniz-Ross theory is likewise invulnerable to the objection regarding coming to know that one is not omnipotent, for, in this theory, an omnipotent being must be essentially omnipotent, and it is not possible that an essentially omnipotent being should come to know that it is not omnipotent. Therefore, as in the stone case, the omnipotent being could bring about someone's coming to know that she is not omnipotent, but not an omnipotent being's coming to know that it is not omnipotent. Finally, no analog to the McEar objection arises for the Leibniz-Ross theory.

While there are no obvious contradictions involved in the Leibniz-Ross theory, there are a number of metaphysical consequences which some have thought odd and, indeed, absurd. First, the Leibniz-Ross theory implies that an omnipotent being exists necessarily. According to Leibniz's formulation, an omnipotent being would be able to actualize any possible world, but it is absurd to suppose that an omnipotent being should actualize a world in which it never existed. It follows that no such world is possible. On Ross's formulation, the obtaining of any state of affairs is logically equivalent to its being chosen by an omnipotent being. Therefore, the obtaining of the state of affairs of no omnipotent being ever existing is logically equivalent to an omnipotent being effectively choosing that no omnipotent being should ever exist, but if no omnipotent being ever exists, then no omnipotent being ever chooses. As a result, the state of affairs of no omnipotent being ever existing cannot possibly obtain (Ross 1969: 213-214). Leibniz and Ross are both proponents of the ontological argument for the existence of God, so they both regard this as a benefit of this theory of omnipotence. Others have, however, found it implausible.

Although many people find it intuitive to suppose that there are possible worlds in which there is no omnipotent being, the Leibniz-Ross theory of omnipotence rules out this possibility. The Leibniz-Ross theory may narrow the space of possible worlds even further, for God, the being Leibniz and Ross believe to be omnipotent, is also supposed to be necessarily morally perfect, and there are worlds which intuitively seem possible which a necessarily morally perfect being could not, it seems, create–for instance, worlds in which the only sentient creatures suffer excruciating pain throughout every moment of their existence. On the Leibniz-Ross theory, if the omnipotent being could not create these worlds, then these worlds are not possible.

Furthermore, the Leibniz-Ross theory entails that an omnipotent being not only cannot create beings it cannot control, but cannot create beings it does not control (Mann 1977). In the Leibniz-Ross theory, an omnipotent being must choose every state of affairs which is to obtain, including all of the choices of its creatures. This is often thought to be a serious threat to human freedom.

All of these concerns with the Leibniz-Ross theory point the same direction: the suggestion that there are logically possible states of affairs which it is nevertheless logically impossible that an omnipotent being, or an omnipotent being who also has the other traditional divine attributes, should actualize. This line of reasoning has led Plantinga to dub the view that God can actualize any possible world “Leibniz's Lapse” (Plantinga 1974: 180-184).

There is disagreement about exactly which, or how many, possible states of affairs cannot possibly be brought about by an omnipotent being. For instance, philosophers disagree about whether the claim that an omnipotent being exists is necessarily true, necessarily false, or contingent. If it is a contingent matter whether an omnipotent being exists, then the state of affairs of no omnipotent being ever existing is possible, but nevertheless cannot possibly be brought about by an omnipotent being. Perhaps the most widely accepted examples, and those Plantinga focuses on, are statements about the free choices of creatures. Plantinga believes that it is logically impossible that any being other than Caesar should bring about the possible state of affairs such as Caesar's freely choosing not to cross the Rubicon, for if Caesar's not crossing the Rubicon had been brought about by some other being (for example, God), then Caesar would not have freely chosen.

If it is accepted that there are some possible states of affairs which it is impossible that an omnipotent being should bring about, a more complicated analysis of omnipotence is needed. An obvious candidate is:

(5)   S is omnipotent =df  S can bring about any state of affairs p such that it is logically possible that S brings about p

However, this brings back the McEar objection, which the Leibniz-Ross theory had escaped. It is essential to McEar that he never bring about anything other than his own scratching of his ear. It is therefore impossible that McEar bring about some other state of affairs. As a result, this definition, once again, wrongly counts McEar as omnipotent, provided only that he is able to scratch his ear. Some philosophers have responded by arguing that there could not possibly be such a being as McEar (Wierenga 1983: 374-375). Others have given up on the project of giving a general analysis of omnipotence (La Croix 1977). Still others have advocated theories of omnipotence which make special accommodation to creaturely freedom (Flint and Freddoso 1983).

An entirely different approach to the problem is advocated by Erik J. Wielenberg (2000). According to Wielenberg, omnipotence cannot be analyzed simply by consideration of which states of affairs an omnipotent being could or could not bring about. Instead, it is necessary to consider why the being could or could not bring them about. Wielenberg proposes the following analysis:

(6) S is omnipotent =df there is no state of affairs p such that S is unable to bring about p at least partially due to lack of power

This analysis avoids attributing omnipotence to McEar since McEar's limitation seems to be at least in part due to lack of power. It also solves the problem of the consistency of God's inability to do evil with omnipotence, since God's inability to do evil is not due to lack of power. Finally, according to Wielenberg, if it is really true that even an omnipotent being could not bring about Caesar's freely choosing not to cross the Rubicon, then this must be due not to lack of power, but to the logic of the situation. The chief limitation of Wielenberg's account is that it makes use of some unanalyzed notions whose analysis philosophers have found quite difficult. These are the notion of lack of power and the notion of one state of affairs obtaining partially due to another state of affairs obtaining. Without analyses of these notions, it is hard to tell whether Wielenberg's analysis is self-consistent and whether it is consistent with other traditional divine attributes.

e. Omnipotence and Time

The Leibniz-Ross theory entails that the exercise of omnipotent power cannot occur within time. This is because, in this view, to exercise omnipotent power is to choose some particular possible world to be actual. To think of such a choice as occurring in time would be to imagine that some possible world could, at some particular time, become actual, having previously been merely possible. This, however, is absurd (Ross 1980: 621). Therefore, on the Leibniz-Ross theory, an omnipotent being can act only atemporally.

The notion of an atemporal action has, however, been found difficult. To give just one example of such a difficulty, it is widely held that acting requires one to be the cause of certain effects. However, many philosophers have also held that it is part of the concept of a cause that it must occur before its effects. Since something atemporal is neither before nor after anything else, there cannot be an atemporal cause, and, therefore, there cannot be an atemporal action.

On the other hand, even apart from the Leibniz-Ross theory, there are difficulties with the notion of being omnipotent at a time. This is because there are contingent states of affairs about the past, but the notion of changing the past is generally agreed to be incoherent (see Time Travel). Thus, omnipotence at a point in time cannot be defined as, for instance, the ability to bring about any contingent state of affairs because, although many past states of affairs are contingent, nothing done in the present, even by an omnipotent being, could possibly bring about a past state of affairs.

Richard Swinburne has proposed an analysis of omnipotence at a point in time based on definition (5) above (Swinburne 1973):

(7) S is omnipotent at time t =df  S is able at t to bring about any state of affairs p such that it is consistent with the facts about what happened before t that, after t, S should bring about p

If the notion of changing the past is incoherent, then (7) does not require that an omnipotent being be able to change the past. However, (7) inherits (5)'s flaw when it comes to McEar: Since it is inconsistent to suppose that McEar (who, by hypothesis, is necessarily such that he only scratches his ear) does something other than scratch his ear, he need not have the power to do anything else in order to count as omnipotent. Additionally, there are well-known problems with specifying which facts are about the past. For instance, consider the fact that the U.S. Declaration of Independence was issued 232 years before President Obama took office. It is difficult to say whether this is a fact about 1776 or about 2008. (Intuitively, it is about both.) In order for (7) to succeed in dealing with the difficulties of temporal omnipotence, there must be a distinction between those facts which are, and those which are not, about the past. However, relational facts like the one under discussion show that it is quite difficult to draw this distinction.

Some philosophers have attempted to meet this difficulty head-on by adopting particular theories of temporal facts (Flint and Freddoso 1983), while others have tried to sidestep the concern by formulating theories of temporal omnipotence which do not require a distinction between past and non-past facts. For instance, Gary Rosenkrantz and Joshua Hoffman advocate the following analysis (Rosenkrantz and Hoffman 1980):

(8) S is omnipotent at t =df  S is able at t to bring about any state of affairs p such that possibly some agent brings about p, and p is unrestrictedly repeatable

Rosenkrantz and Hoffman introduce a number of further qualifications, but the central point of their account is the notion of unrestricted repeatability. Intuitively, an unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs is one that can obtain, cease to obtain, and then obtain again indefinitely many times, throughout all of history. Mt. Vesuvius's erupting is unrestrictedly repeatable, but Mt. Vesuvius's erupting prior to 1900 is not, since the latter cannot obtain at any time after 1900. Rosenkrantz and Hoffman hold that an omnipotent being could, before 1900, have brought about Mt. Vesuvius's erupting prior to 1900 by, at that time, bringing about Mt. Vesuvius's erupting. After 1900, an omnipotent being could still bring about the latter state of affairs, though not the former. Since the former state of affairs is not unrestrictedly repeatable, the inability to bring it about after 1900 is no bar to a being's counting as omnipotent.

2. Omnipotence and Necessary Moral Perfection

According to the New Testament, “God cannot be tempted with evil” (James 1:13) and it is “impossible for God to lie” (Hebrews 6:18). Traditionally, these divine inabilities are taken quite seriously, and are said to follow from God's attribute of impeccability or necessary moral perfection. According to this view, it is impossible for God to do evil. It seems, however, that no being could be both omnipotent and necessarily morally perfect, since an omnipotent being could do anything, but there are many things a necessarily morally perfect being could not do.

The argument can be formulated as follows (Morriston 2001: 144). Consider some particularly evil state of affairs, E, such as every sentient being suffering excruciating pain throughout its entire existence. Then:

(1)   If any being is necessarily morally perfect, then there is no possible world at which that being brings about E

(2)   If any being is omnipotent, then that being has the power to bring about E

(3)   If any being has the power to bring about E, then there is some possible world at which that being brings about E


(4)   No being is both necessarily morally perfect and omnipotent

Some theists have simply accepted the conclusion, replacing either necessary moral perfection or omnipotence with some weaker property. For instance, Nelson Pike famously argued that, although no being would deserve the title “God” unless that being were morally perfect, there are nevertheless possible worlds in which the being who is in fact God is not morally perfect, and therefore is not God (Pike 1969). Pike's view is, in essence, a rather complicated version of the claim that God is only contingently morally perfect, a view which some have regarded as extremely objectionable from a theological standpoint (Geach 1977).

A number of philosophers who have accepted the incompatibility of omnipotence with necessary moral perfection have regarded the latter as more central to religious notions of God, and have argued that divine omnipotence should therefore be rejected (Geach 1977; Morriston 2001; Funkhouser 2006).

Defenders of the compatibility of omnipotence and necessary moral perfection must deny at least one of the premises of the argument, and, indeed, each of them has been denied. Premise (1) is perhaps the most difficult to reject. To be necessarily morally perfect is to be morally perfect in every possible world, but there seem to be some states of affairs such that bringing them about is inconsistent with moral perfection, and so it seems that if any being is necessarily morally perfect, then there are some states of affairs which that being does not bring about in any possible world. However, defenders of certain sorts of divine command theories of ethics are committed to the claim that God is morally perfect only in a trivial sense, and these views will have the result that (1) is false. If what is morally good depends on God's choice, then, if God chose something else, that something else would be morally good. If this is right, then (1) is false: God could bring about E, but if he did bring about E, then E would be morally good. However, most philosophers regard this line of thought as tending to show the absurdity of these versions of divine command theory, rather than the falsity of (1).

Premise (2) can be rejected by those philosophers who regard omnipotence as the ability to perform any action or bring about any result which is consistent with the actor's nature, as in definitions (2), (5), and (7).  However, these definitions fall prey to the McEar objection and, more generally, open the door to all kinds of limitations on what an omnipotent being can do.

Many philosophers of action take it as an axiom that there are no necessarily unexercised powers (or abilities, or capacities), and (3) is merely an instance of this general principle. Nevertheless, the rejection of (3) is defended by Wielenberg (2000), who argues by means of the following analogy. Suppose that Hercules is “omni-strong” that is, he has sufficient strength to lift stones of any weight. Suppose, however, that a certain stone is too slippery for him to get a grip on. He therefore cannot lift it. Hercules' inability to lift the slippery stone does not count against his omni-strength, since the stone is not too heavy for him, but only too slippery.

In the same way, Wielenberg argues, there are many things which it is not possible for God to do. However, God is omnipotent, since it is not for lack of power that God is unable to do these things, but for other reasons, such as his necessary moral perfection. The aptness of Wielenberg's analogy is still open to dispute, and the principle that there are no necessarily unexercised powers continues to be widely accepted.

3. Omnipotence and Human Freedom

It is sometimes argued that if the existence of an omnipotent agent is possible, then the existence of a non-omnipotent free agent is impossible. According to this line of thought, if Caesar was free, then Caesar, and only Caesar, could have brought about Caesar's freely refraining from crossing the Rubicon. However, if Caesar could have brought about that state of affairs, then it must be a possible state of affairs, and an omnipotent being could therefore bring it about. This, however, cannot be correct, for if someone other than Caesar brought about Caesar's refraining, then Caesar would not have refrained freely. Therefore, an omnipotent being could not bring about this state of affairs. But if even an omnipotent being could not bring it about, then surely Caesar, who is not omnipotent, could not bring it about either. Therefore, Caesar was not free and, by parity of reasoning, neither is any other non-omnipotent agent.

The Leibniz-Ross theory renders the problem even more acute. According to Leibniz, God chooses precisely which possible world will obtain. God, therefore, chooses whether Caesar will cross the Rubicon. However, if someone else chooses what Caesar will do, then Caesar is not free. Similarly, for Ross, Caesar's crossing the Rubicon is logically equivalent to God's effectively choosing that Caesar cross the Rubicon. The choice is up to God. It is therefore not up to Caesar, at least not in the sense which (according to some philosophers) is required for free will.

Neither Leibniz nor Ross finds this objection particularly troubling. According to Leibniz, since it is possible that Caesar freely refrain from crossing the Rubicon, there must be a possible world which represents him as doing so. In making a world actual, God does not in any way change the intrinsic character of that world (Leibniz 1985: sect. 52). As a result, had God brought about that world, Caesar would still have been free. Similarly, Ross suggests that whatever sort of independence from external determination freedom requires, it certainly does not require that the agent's choice be independent of its own logical entailments. However, in his view, God's effectively choosing that the agent so choose is logically equivalent to the agent's so choosing, and so cannot be inconsistent with freedom (Ross 1980: sect. 2).

Compatibilists about free will may be satisfied with the responses given by Leibniz and Ross. Libertarians, however, have generally not been satisfied, and have argued that an omnipotent being need not have the power to bring about such states of affairs as Caesar's freely refraining from crossing the Rubicon. Most of those who have been so concerned have followed an approach developed by Plantinga (1974: ch. 9). This approach hinges on the existence of a class of propositions known as counterfactuals of freedom. A counterfactual of freedom is a statement about what an individual would freely choose if faced with a certain hypothetical circumstance. For instance, the claim, "If Caesar were offered a bribe of fifty talents, he would freely refrain from crossing the Rubicon," is a counterfactual of freedom. Now, suppose that Brutus wants Caesar to freely refrain. If he uses force to prevent Caesar from crossing the Rubicon, then he has not succeeded in bringing it about that Caesar freely refrains, for in this case, Caesar's refraining has been brought about by Brutus and not by Caesar, and so Caesar did not do it freely. This sort of bringing about is known as strongly actualizing. Only Caesar can strongly actualize Caesar's freely refraining from crossing the Rubicon. However, if Brutus knows that if Caesar were offered the bribe, he would freely refrain, then there is a sense in which Brutus can bring it about that Caesar freely refrains: Brutus can strongly actualize the state of affairs Caesar's being offered the bribe, and he knows that if he does this then Caesar will freely refrain. In such a case, Brutus would be said to have weakly actualized Caesar's freely refraining.

According to Plantinga, in order for creatures to be free, it must not be up to anyone else which counterfactuals of freedom are true of them, so even an omnipotent being could not bring it about that particular counterfactuals of freedom are true. However, an omnipotent being could presumably bring it about that it knows the true counterfactuals of freedom (or if the omnipotent being was also essentially omniscient, then it would already know), and it could presumably strongly actualize many of their antecedents, and so weakly actualize a variety of states of affairs in which non-omnipotent beings acted freely. An omnipotent being could not, however, weakly actualize just any possible state of affairs. For instance, if there were no possible circumstance such that, if Caesar were in that circumstance, he would freely refrain from crossing the Rubicon, then even an omnipotent being could not weakly actualize Caesar's freely refraining.

Among those who accept Plantinga's arguments, some have attempted to analyze omnipotence in terms of what an omnipotent being could strongly actualize, and made appropriate qualifications for free actions. It is typically pointed out that it is logically impossible for any being to strongly actualize a state of affairs in which another being makes a free choice, and it suffices for omnipotence that a being be able to strongly actualize those states of affairs which it is logically possible that that being should strongly actualize (Wierenga 1983). This approach, however, runs into McEar-style counterexamples. Others have attempted to analyze omnipotence in terms of what an omnipotent being could weakly actualize. Flint and Freddoso (1983) require that an omnipotent being S be able to weakly actualize any possibly actualized state of affairs which is consistent with the counterfactuals of freedom about beings other than S. However, as Graham Oppy has pointed out, Flint and Freddoso's analysis also seems to make omnipotence too easy, since on Flint and Freddoso's account a being who could not strongly actualize such mundane states of affairs as a five-pound stone's being lifted or a barn's being painted red could turn out to be omnipotent if it was able to weakly actualize them (Oppy 2004, 74-75).

4. Omnipotence and the Problem of Evil

Divine omnipotence is typically used as a key premise in the famous argument against the existence of God known as the Logical Problem of Evil. The argument can be formulated as follows:

(1)   An omnipotent being would be able to bring about any possible world

(2)   Given the opportunity to bring about some world, a morally perfect being would only bring about the best world available to it

(3)   The actual world is not the best possible world


(4)   The actual world was not brought about by a being who is both omnipotent and morally perfect

The argument is here formulated in Leibnizian terms, and Leibniz notoriously rejected premise (3). Premise (2) has also been rejected: some philosophers have denied that there is a unique best possible world and others, most notably Robert Adams, have argued that even if there is such a world, creating it might not be the best course of action (Adams 1972). However, the premise that is of present concern is (1). Although (1) is accepted by Leibniz and Ross, considerations related to necessary moral perfection and human freedom have led many philosophers to reject it. This is the central premise of Plantinga's Free Will Defense against the Logical Problem of Evil (Plantinga 1974, ch. 9): If there are worlds that God, though omnipotent, cannot bring about, then the best possible world might be one of these. If this is so, then, despite being both omnipotent and morally perfect, God would bring about a world which was less than the best, such as, perhaps, the actual world.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew (1972). Must God create the best? Philosophical Review 81 (3):317-332.
  • Aquinas, St. Thomas. 1921 [1274]. The summa theologica of St. Thomas Aquinas. 2nd ed. Trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. London: Burns Oates & Washbourne.
    • Part 1, Qu. 25, Art. 3 argues that omnipotence should be understood as the ability to do anything that is absolutely possible, that is, that does not imply a contradiction.
  • Cowan, J. L. 1965. The paradox of omnipotence. Analysis 25:102-108.
    • Argues, against Mavrodes 1963, that the Stone Paradox cannot be solved by claiming that God can perform only logically possible tasks.
  • Curley, E. M. 1984. Descartes on the creation of the eternal truths. The Philosophical Review 93:569-597.
  • Descartes, Rene. 1984-1991 [1619-1649]. The philosophical writings of Descartes. Trans. JohnCottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny. 3 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Defends voluntarism, the thesis that God can do literally anything, even draw a round square. See 2:294 (Sixth Replies) and 3:23-26 (letters to Mersenne).
  • Flint, Thomas P., and Alfred J. Freddoso. 1983. Maximal power. In The existence and nature of God, ed. Alfred J. Freddoso. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • Combines the apparatus of Plantinga 1974 with an Ockhamist account of foreknowledge to develop a result theory sensitive to issues about time and freedom.
  • Frankfurt, Harry G. 1964. The logic of omnipotence. Philosophical Review 73 (2): 262-263.
    • Points out that if, as Descartes supposed, God can do the logically impossible, then God can create a stone too heavy for him to lift and still lift it.
  • Funkhouser, Eric. 2006. On privileging God's moral goodness. Faith and Philosophy 23 (4): 409-422.
    • Argues that omnipotence is incompatible with necessary moral perfection, and that omnipotence is not a perfection, and therefore should not be attributed to God.
  • Geach, P. T. 1973. Omnipotence. Philosophy 48 (183): 7-20.
    • Considers four theories of omnipotence and argues that they are all unacceptable.
  • La Croix, Richard R. 1977. The impossibility of defining 'omnipotence'. Philosophical Studies 32 (2):181-190.
    • Argues that every possible definition of omnipotence either renders omnipotence inconsistent with traditional divine attributes or falls prey to McEar-style counterexamples. This article is responsible for introducing the name 'McEar.'
  • Leibniz, G. W. 1985 [1710]. Theodicy. Ed. Austin Farrer. Trans. E. M. Huggard. La Salle, Ill.: Open Court.
    • Argues that God's omnipotence consists in his ability to actualize any possible world, but God is impelled by a'moral necessity' to choose the best.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1955. Evil and omnipotence. Mind 64 (254): 200-212.
    • Argues that it is incoherent to suppose that a world containing evil was created by an omnipotent and perfectly good being.
  • Mann, William E. 1977. Ross on omnipotence. International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 8 (2):142-147.
    • Shows that, given Ross's theory of omnipotence (Ross 1969), an omnipotent being cannot freely decide to leave it up to others whether a certain state of affairs should obtain.
  • Mavrodes, George I. 1963. Some puzzles concerning omnipotence. Philosophical Review 72 (2):221-223.
    • Argues that an omnipotent being could not create a stone so heavy he could not lift it, since the notion of a stone too heavy to be lifted by an omnipotent being is incoherent.
  • Meierding, Loren. 1980. The impossibility of necessary omnitemporal omnipotence. International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 11 (1): 21-26.
    • Formalizes Swinburne's argument that only necessary omnitemporal omnipotence is incoherent (Swinburne 1973).
  • Morriston, Wes. 2001. Omnipotence and necessary moral perfection: are they compatible? Religious Studies 37 (2): 143-160.
    • Argues that no being could be both omnipotent and necessarily morally perfect.
  • Oppy, Graham. 2005. Omnipotence. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 71 (1): 58-84.
    • Criticizes several recent theories of omnipotence (Rosenkrantz and Hoffman 1980; Flint and Freddoso 1983; Wierenga 1983) and argues that the God of 'orthodox monotheism' should not be regarded as omnipotent at all.
  • Pike, Nelson. 1969. Omnipotence and God's ability to sin. American Philosophical Quarterly 6 (3):208-216.
    • Argues that the individual who is in fact God is able to sin, but that the sentence 'God sins' is nevertheless necessarily false.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1967. God and other minds: a study of the rational justification of belief in God. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
    • Ch. 7, sect. 2 introduced the 'McEar' counterexample to certain definitions of omnipotence (p. 170).
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1974. The nature of necessity. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Chapter 9 argues that there are possible worlds which God, though omnipotent, cannot actualize.
  • Rosenkrantz, Gary, and Joshua Hoffman. 1980. What an omnipotent agent can do. International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 11 (1): 1-19.
    • Defends a result theory according to which an omnipotent agent can actualize any unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs.
  • Ross, James F. 1969. Philosophical theology. Indianapolis: Bobbs Merrill.
    • Omnipotence is the topic of chapter 5. After a survey of Scholastic theories of omnipotence, Ross argues that no act theory of omnipotence can succeed. Ross then presents his own theory according to which a being is omnipotent if for any contingent state of affairs p, it is up to that being to choose whether p obtains.
  • Ross, James F. 1980. Creation. Journal of Philosophy 77 (10): 614-629.
    • Further develops, and defends from objections, the account of omnipotence given in Ross 1969. Section 2 answers the objection that Ross's theory leaves no room for human freedom (Mann 1977).
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1973. Omnipotence. American Philosophical Quarterly 10: 231-237.
    • Argues that a result theory can, and an act theory cannot, defeat the Stone Paradox. However, it is conceded that the Paradox shows that no temporal being could be essentially omnipotent.
  • Wielenberg, Erik J. 2000. Omnipotence again. Faith and Philosophy 17 (1): 26-47.
    • Criticizes Wierenga 1983 and Flint and Freddoso 1983 and argues for a result theory according to which there is no state of affairs such that lack of power prevents an omnipotent being from actualizing it.
  • Wierenga, Edward R. 1983. Omnipotence defined. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 43 (3):363-375.
    • Defends a result theory, and argues that a being like McEar is impossible.

Author Information

Kenneth L. Pearce
University of Southern California
U. S. A.

Skeptical Theism

Skeptical theism is the view that God exists but that we should be skeptical of our ability to discern God’s reasons for acting or refraining from acting in any particular instance.  In particular, says the skeptical theist, we should not grant that our inability to think of a good reason for doing or allowing something is indicative of whether or not God might have a good reason for doing or allowing something.  If there is a God, he knows much more than we do about the relevant facts, and thus it would not be surprising at all if he has reasons for doing or allowing something that we cannot fathom.

If skeptical theism is true, it appears to undercut the primary argument for atheism, namely the argument from evil.  This is because skeptical theism provides a reason to be skeptical of a crucial premise in the argument from evil, namely the premise that asserts that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  If we are not in a position to tell whether God has a reason for allowing any particular instance of evil, then we are not in a position to judge whether any of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  And if we cannot tell whether any of the evils in our world are gratuitous, then we cannot appeal to the existence of gratuitous evil to conclude that God does not exist.  The remainder of this article explains skeptical theism more fully, applies it to the argument from evil, and surveys the reasons for and against being a skeptical theist.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction to Skeptical Theism
  2. The Argument from Evil
  3. Responses to the Argument from Evil
    1. Denying the Minor Premise
    2. Skepticism about the Minor Premise
  4. Defenses of Skeptical Theism
    1. Arguments from Analogy
    2. Arguments from Complexity
    3. Arguments from Enabling Premises
  5. Objections to Skeptical Theism
    1. Implications for the Divine-Human Relationship
    2. Implications for Everyday Knowledge
    3. Implications for Commonsense Epistemology
    4. Implications for Moral Theory
    5. Implications for Moral Living
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction to Skeptical Theism

Skeptical theism is a conjunction of two theses.  The first thesis of skeptical theism is that theism is true, where “theism” is roughly the view that God exists and “God,” in turn, is an honorific title describing the most perfect being possible.  This is the being putatively described in classical western theologies of Judaism, Christianity, Islam, and some theistic forms of Eastern religions.  The second thesis is that a certain limited form of skepticism is true, where this skepticism applies to the ability of humans to make all-things-considered judgments about what God would do or allow in any particular situation.  Not all theists are skeptical theists, and not all of the philosophers who endorse the skeptical component of skeptical theism are theists.  Since it is the skeptical component that is of most interest, it will be the focus in what follows.

It is important to get clear on the scope of the skepticism endorsed by skeptical theists.  First, it is not a global skepticism—skeptical theists are not committed to the view that we cannot know anything at all.  Instead, the skepticism is (putatively) limited to a narrow range of propositions, namely those having to do with God’s reasons for action.  For example, a skeptical theist could admit that humans have ceteris paribus knowledge of God’s reasons for actions.  An example of such knowledge might be the following: other-things-being-equal, God will eliminate suffering when he is able to do so.  However, knowing this latter claim is consistent with denying that we know the following: God will eliminate this particular instance of suffering.  Holding the combination of these two views is possible for the following reason: while we might know that other-things-being-equal, God will eliminate suffering when he is able to do so, we might not know whether or not other things are equal in any particular instance of suffering.

As an example of this limited sort of skepticism, consider a much more mundane example.  One might know that other-things-being-equal, it is better to save aces in a hand of draw poker (since aces are the highest denomination).  However, one might know this while at the same time withholding judgment on whether or not it is a good idea for Jones to save aces in any particular hand, since one would not know what Jones’ other cards were (for example, perhaps saving an ace requires discarding a member of a four-of-a-kind set in another denomination).

2. The Argument from Evil

Agnosticism is the philosophical view that neither affirms that God exists nor affirms that God does not exist.  On the other hand, atheism is the view that God does not exist.  Perhaps the most powerful argument for atheism is the argument from evil.  According to this line of reasoning, the fact that the world contains evil is powerful evidence that God does not exist.  This is because God is supposed to be the most perfect being possible, and among these perfections is both perfect power and perfect goodness.  If God were perfectly powerful, then he would be able to eliminate all instances of evil.  If God were perfectly good, then he would want to eliminate all instances of evil.  Thus, if God exists, there would be no evil.  But there is evil.  Therefore, God does not exist.

While the foregoing sketches the rough terrain, the argument from evil comes in two distinct forms.  First is the logical problem of evil.  According to the logical problem of evil, it is not logically possible for both evil and God to coexist.  Any world in which God exists will be a world devoid of any evil.  Thus, anyone who believes both that God exists and that evil exists is committed to an implicit contradiction.

Second is the evidential argument from evil. According to the evidential argument from evil, while it is logically possible that both God and evil coexist, the latter is evidence against the former.  The evidential argument is sometimes put in terms of an inference to the best explanation (that is, the abductive argument from evil) and sometimes in terms of probabilities (that is, the inductive argument from evil).  In either case, certain facts about the existence, nature and distribution of evils in the world are offered as pro tanto evidence against the truth of theism.  This article focuses on the probabilistic (inductive) version of the evidential argument from evil as it is the most common in the contemporary literature.

It is widely conceded that there is no logical problem of evil for the following reason: if there is a God, he would allow any particular instance of evil that is necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good.  For instance, the experience of pain is an intrinsic evil.  However, the fact that a human father allows his child to experience the pain of an inoculation does not thereby show that the father is not perfectly good.  That is because, although evil in itself, the pain was necessary to secure a compensating good, namely being immune to a painful or deadly disease.  Philosophers call any instance of evil that is not necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good a gratuitous evil.  Thus, it is only the existence of gratuitous evil (instead of any evil whatsoever) that poses a (putative) problem for theism.

With the distinction between gratuitous and non-gratuitous evil in hand, the evidential argument from evil can be formulated as follows:

1. If God exists, then there are no instances of gratuitous evil.

2. It is likely that at least some instances of evil are gratuitous.

3. Therefore, it is likely that God does not exist.

The gist is that insofar as we have reason to believe that at least some of the evils in our world are not necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good, we have reason to believe that God does not exist.  So there is still a sense in which a logical problem of evil remains—it is logically impossible that God and gratuitous evil coexist.  The evidential nature of this argument focuses around premise (2): the best we can do is to present an inductive case for the claim that any particular evil in our world is gratuitous.

3. Responses to the Argument from Evil

Theists have challenged both premises in the argument from evil.  Regarding premise (1), some have challenged the notion that God is required by his moral perfection to eliminate all instances of gratuitous evil (for example, Van Inwagen 2003).  However, by and large, theists have focused their attention on the minor premise: the claim that it is likely that some of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  There are two ways of responding to this premise.  One may either deny it or seek to show that we should be agnostic about it.  Each strategy is sketched below.

a. Denying the Minor Premise

Challenges to the argument from evil that purport to show that premise (2) is false are typically called theodicies.  A theodicy is an attempt to show that no actual evil in our world is gratuitous, or, in logically equivalent terms, that all the evils in our world are necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good.  If a theist can successfully show this, then premise (2) in the argument from evil is false, and the argument from evil is unsound.

Theodicies take a number of different forms.  Some try to show that the evils in our world are necessary for compensating goods such as moral development, significant free will, and so on.  Others try to show that evils in our world are necessary to avoid evils equally bad or worse.  In either case, a successful theodicy will have to be thorough—if even one instance of evil in the world turns out to be gratuitous, the minor premise is true and the argument from evil goes through.

b. Skepticism about the Minor Premise

The burden of proof for a theodicy is tremendously high.  The theodicist must show that all of the evils in our world are non-gratuitous.  For this reason, many theistic philosophers prefer only to show that we should be agnostic about premise (2).  Skepticism about premise (2) is typically defended in one of two ways: by appeal to a defense or by appeal to the resources of skeptical theism.

Unlike a theodicy, a defense does not attempt to show what God’s actual reason is for allowing any particular instance of evil.  Instead, it attempts to show what God’s reasons might be for all we know.  And if God might have reasons for allowing a particular evil that we do not know about, then we are in no position to endorse premise (2) in the evidential argument from evil.  The idea is that there are relevant alternatives that we are in no position to rule out, and unless we are in such a position, we should not conclude that the minor premise is true.

For example, suppose you are a jurist in a criminal case, and—given only the videotape evidence—you cannot determine whether the defendant or his twin committed the crime.  In this case, you are not justified in concluding that the defendant is guilty, and that is because there is a live possibility that you cannot rule out, and this possibility would show that the defendant is innocent.  The same might be said of premise (2) in the argument from evil: there are live possibilities that we are in no position to rule out, and these possibilities show that God is justified in allowing the evils in our world.  And if so, we are in no position to endorse premise (2) of the argument from evil.

Skeptical theism provides a second, independent case for agnosticism about premise (2).  This case takes the form of an undercutting defeater for the standard defense of premise (2).  Why should we think that it is likely that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous?  The standard defense of this claim is as follows:

Well, it seems like many of the evils in our world are gratuitous, so it is likely that at least some instances of evil are gratuitous.

Put differently, we cannot see any reason for God to allow some of the evils in our world, therefore there we should conclude that there is no reason for God to allow some of the evils in our world.  Call this inference pattern the “noseeum” inference (“if we can’t see ‘um, they ain’t there”).

The skeptical theist denies the strength of this noseeum inference.  The fact that an evil appears to be gratuitous to us is not indicative of whether or not it is gratuitous.  So on the one hand, the skeptical theist is happy to grant that it seems as if many of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  However, she denies that this fact is good evidence for the claim that such evils really are gratuitous.  And hence we have no reason to endorse premise (2) in the argument from evil.

4. Defenses of Skeptical Theism

As a reply to the argument from evil, skeptical theism seems initially quite plausible.  Surely if there were a God, there would be many, many cases in which we could see no reason for a course of action although such reasons were available to God. Some things that look unjustifiable given our own perspectives are justifiable once one has all the facts.  Besides relying on this initial plausibility, skeptical theists have defended their view in roughly three ways.

a. Arguments from Analogy

The fact that a young child cannot discern a reason for her parents allowing her to suffer pain does not constitute a good reason for the young child to conclude that there are no such reasons.  In this case, a clear example of the noseeum inference fails.  Given the child’s limited knowledge and experience as compared to the knowledge and experience of her parents, she ought not conclude that her parents are not justified in allowing a certain evil to occur.  Other similar examples are easy to come by: if one does not play much chess, the fact that one cannot see why the chess master makes a particular move is not indicative of whether or not such a move is justified.  It would be silly to reason as follows: I cannot see a good reason for that move, therefore, there is no good reason for that move.

If these cases are persuasive, the skeptical theist can defend her position accordingly.  The cognitive distance between a young child and her parents is analogous to the cognitive position between a human agent and God.  Thus, the fact that a human is unable to see a reason for allowing a particular evil is not a good reason for concluding that God would have no reason for allowing that evil.

b. Arguments from Complexity

On its face, premise (2) is very straightforward: it is very likely that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  But when we get clear on what that means, we see that this kind of judgment is extraordinarily complex.  It says, in effect, that we are able to identify some instances of evil which were not necessary either to avoid an evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating good.  How could we ever know such complex facts?  For example, consider the following:

On the night that Sir Winston Churchill was conceived, had Lady Randolph Churchill fallen asleep in a slightly different position, the precise pathway that each of the millions of spermatozoa took would have been slightly altered.  As a result…Sir Winston Churchill, as we knew him, would not have existed, with the likely result that the evolution of World War II would have been substantially different… (Durston 2000, p. 66)

On the face of it, it appears that it would not matter what position Lady Churchill sleeps in.  Put differently, it appears that there is no good reason to prefer her sleeping in one position rather than another.  But given the specifics of human reproduction, this assumption is unwarranted and—in this case—plausibly false.  So the fact that we cannot see a reason is not indicative of whether or not there is any such reason.  This same objection applies, mutatis mutandis, to the inference from “we can see no reason to allow this evil” to “there is no reason to allow this evil.”

c. Arguments from Enabling Premises

One of the most sophisticated defenses of skeptical theism insists that some sort of enabling premise must be reasonably believed before noseeum inferences are warranted and, further, that this enabling premise is not reasonably believed with regard to inferences about what God would allow.  Two such enabling premises have been proposed in the literature: the first concerns our sensitivity to evidence and the second concerns the representativeness of our inductive samples.

The most common instance of the sensitivity strategy invokes an epistemic principle dubbed the Condition on Reasonable Epistemic Access, or “CORNEA” for short (Wyskstra 1984).  CORNEA says that inferences from “I see no X” to “There is no X” are justified only if it is reasonable to believe that if there were an X, I would likely see it.  So, for example, the inference from “I see no elephant in my office” to “There is no elephant in my office” is licensed by CORNEA since I reasonably believe that if there were an elephant in my office, I would likely see it.  However, such skeptical theists have insisted that it is not reasonable for me to think that if there were a reason for allowing any particular evil that I would be aware of it.  Given this assumption, CORNEA says that the inference from “I see no reason for allowing this instance of evil” to “There is no reason for allowing this instance of evil” is invalid.

The second strategy has to do with our knowledge of the representativeness of the inductive sample used in the noseeum inference.  According to this version of the strategy, the inductive move from “I see no X” to “There is no X” is warranted only if it is reasonable for me to believe that my inductive sample of X’s is representative of the whole.  For example, one should not rely on inductive evidence to conclude that all crows are black unless it is reasonable to assume that one’s sample of crows is representative of all crows.  As applied to the argument from evil, the inference from “I can see no reason to allow this evil” to “There is no reason to allow this evil” is justified only if it is reasonable for one to believe that the sample of reasons currently understood is representative of all of the reasons that are.  The crucial question then becomes whether or not any of us have good reason to think that our sample of goods, evils, and the connections between them is suitably representative.  Some philosophers think that we do have such reason (for example, Tooley 1991).  Others think that our knowledge is not representative (for example, Sennett 1993).  Others think we cannot tell one way or the other whether our sample is representative, and thus we lack good reason for thinking that the sample is representative, as required by the second strategy (for example, Bergmann 2001).

5. Objections to Skeptical Theism

As with any form of skepticism, skeptical theism has its critics.  Some of these critics are theists who think that skeptical theism has unbecoming implications for issues of importance to theism (such as knowledge of God, relationship with God, and the like).  Other critics think that skeptical theism has unbecoming implications for more general issues such as everyday knowledge, moral living, and so on.  The objections to skeptical theism fall roughly into five different sorts.

a. Implications for the Divine-Human Relationship

One prominent criticism of skeptical theism is that it eliminates the potential for a close relationship between humans and God.  It does so in two ways.  First, if skeptical theism undercuts arguments against the existence of God by highlighting the fact that we know very little about how God would act (all-things-considered), then by parity of reasoning it also undercuts arguments for the existence of God.  Skeptical theist considerations seem to suggest agnosticism about whether God would create a world, finely-tune the universe, create rational beings, and so on, despite the fact that each of these are assumptions in standard arguments for the existence of God.  And the same considerations appear to undercut our knowledge of God’s interactions in the world; it is no longer open to the theist to say what God wants in her life (all-things-considered), whether a particular event was a miracle, and so on.

Second, skeptical theism not only appears to undercut one’s knowledge of God, but it also seems to undercut one’s trust in God.  Being in a close relationship with another person requires some kind of understanding of what the other person wants and why the other person acts as she does.  Furthermore, communication is important to a relationship, but skeptical theists should not trust communication from God (including divine commands, mystical experiences, and so on).  Why?  Because for all we know, God has a reason for deceiving us that is beyond our ken.

b. Implications for Everyday Knowledge

Any non-global version of skepticism will face objections that attempt to stretch the skepticism to new areas of inquiry.  One objection of this sort claims that skeptical theism breaks down into a near-global skepticism that disallows what we might think of as everyday knowledge.  Consider the claim that all crows are black.  This seems a perfect example of everyday knowledge.  But a skeptical crowist might respond as follows: “for all we know, there are purple crows beyond our ken, thus, the fact that we see no purple crows is not indicative of the fact that there are no purple crows.”  Thus we do not know the claim that all crows are black.

c. Implications for Commonsense Epistemology

Others have argued not that skeptical theism is incompatible with any particular knowledge claim but that it is incompatible with a promising set of theories in epistemology.  In particular, skeptical theism appears to rule out so-called commonsense epistemologies that rely on something like the principle of credulity: other things being equal, it is reasonable to believe that things are as they appear.  The problem is that skeptical theists grant that at least some evils appear gratuitous, thus, by the principle of credulity, they ought to grant that it is reasonable to believe that at least some evils are gratuitous.  But that is precisely what skeptical theism denies.

d. Implications for Moral Theory

The skeptical theist’s strategy relies on the presumption that there are some moral judgments that we are not justified in making.  Consider an instance of childhood cancer.  The skeptical theist is unwilling to grant that this evil is gratuitous because—for all we know—it was necessary either to prevent some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating good.  Furthermore, if the evil is not gratuitous, it seems that it would be morally permissible (or even morally obligatory) for God to allow that evil to occur.  This is how the skeptical theist hopes to get God off the hook: we cannot blame him for creating the actual world if he meets all of his moral obligations in doing so.

The putative problem is that the skeptical theist seems to be committed to a consequentialist view of ethics, and many philosophers find such a view unappealing.  The apparent implications result from the fact that a skeptical theist seems to allow that no matter how horrendous a particular instance of evil might be, it can always be justified given good enough consequences.  Thus, if one thinks that there are some things that morally ought not be allowed regardless of consequences (such as the torture of an innocent person), this putative implication counts against skeptical theism.

e. Implications for Moral Living

Finally, the most pressing objection to skeptical theism is that it seems to preclude both the possibility of engaging in moral deliberation and the possibility of moral knowledge.  The putative problem can be sketched as follows: if, for any instance of evil, we are unable to tell whether or not the evil is gratuitous, then we are unable to engage in moral deliberation and arrive at a view about what is reasonable for us to do.  For example, suppose a skeptical theist comes upon a young boy drowning in a pond.  His skeptical theism seems to commit him to reasoning as follows: for all I know, the boy’s death is necessary to prevent some greater evil or to secure some greater good, thus I do not have a reason to intervene.

Skeptical theists have offered a number of interesting responses to this objection.  Some think that what is wrong for a person depends only on what he or she knows, and thus it would be wrong for the bystander to let the boy drown since he does not know that the boy’s death is non-gratuitous.  Others think that what is right for God to allow might be different than what is right for us to allow.  In that case, it might be wrong for you to let the boy drown even though you cannot conclude (for skeptical theist reasons) that it is wrong for God to do the same.  Still others insist that there is no unique difficulty here: everyone faces the hurdle of attempting to decide whether a particular event will have, on balance, good or bad consequences.  In that case, though it is true that moral deliberation is difficult given skeptical theism, it is also difficult given any view of religious epistemology.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Almeida, M. & Oppy, G. (2003) “Sceptical Theism and Evidential Arguments from Evil,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 81:4, pp. 496-516.
    • An objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for the moral life.
  • Alston, W. (1991) “The Inductive Argument from Evil and the Human Cognitive Condition,” Philosophical Perspectives 5, pp. 29-67.
    • A defense of skeptical theism by appeal to analogy.
  • Bergmann, M. (2001) “Skeptical Theism and Rowe’s New Evidential Argument from Evil,” Nous 35, pp. 278-296.
    • Seminal statement of skeptical theism and a defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises.
  • Draper, P. (1989) “Pain and Pleasure: An Evidential Problem for Theists,” Nous 23, pp. 331-350.
    • A concise statement of the abductive argument from evil.
  • Dougherty, T. (2008) “Epistemological Considerations Concerning Skeptical Theism,” Faith & Philosophy 25, pp. 172-176.
    • An objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for commonsense epistemology.
  • Durston, K. (2000) “The consequential complexity of history and gratuitous evil,” Religious Studies 36, pp. 65-80.
    • A defense of skeptical theism by appeal to complexity.
  • Hasker, W. (2004) “The sceptical solution to the problem of evil,” in Hasker, W. Providence, Evil, and the Openness of God (Routledge) pp. 43-57.
    • An example of an objection to skeptical theism by a theist
  • Hick, J. (1966) Evil and the God of Love (Harper & Rowe).
    • A clear presentation and defense of a soul-crafting theodicy.
  • Howard-Snyder, D. (2010) “Epistemic Humility, Arguments from Evil, and Moral Skepticism,”in Kvanvig, J. (ed.) Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Religion (Oxford: Oxford University Press) pp. 17-57.
    • Responding to an objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for moral living.
  • Jordan, J. (2006) “Does Skeptical Theism Lead to Moral Skepticism?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 72, pp. 403-416.
    • An objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for moral living.
  • Mackie, J.L. (1955) “Evil and Omnipotence,” Mind 64:254, pp. 200-212.
    • The classic statement of the logical problem of evil.
  • McBrayer, J. (2010) “Skeptical Theism,” Philosophy Compass 4:1, pp. 1-13 (Blackwell).
    • A thorough review of the case for and against skeptical theism with an exhaustive bibliography.
  • McBrayer, J. (2009) “CORNEA and Inductive Evidence,” Faith & Philosophy 26:1, pp. 77-86.
    • An objection to the defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises
  • Plantinga, A. (1974) God, Freedom, and Evil (Eerdmans).
    • The classic response to the logical problem of evil.
  • Rowe, W. (2001) “Skeptical Theism: A Response to Bergmann,” Nous 35, pp. 297-303.
    • An objection to the defense of skeptical theism by appeal to analogies and enabling premises.
  • Rowe, W. (1979) “The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism,” American Philosophical Quarterly 16, pp. 335-41.
    • A clear and classic statement of the evidential argument from evil.
  • Sennett, J. (1993) “The Inscrutable Evil Defense against the Inductive Argument from Evil,” Faith & Philosophy 10, pp. 220-229.
    • A defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises.
  • Tooley, M. (1991) “The Argument from Evil,” Philosophical Perspectives 5, pp. 89-134.
    • An objection to the defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises.
  • Trakakis, N. (2003) “Evil and the complexity of history: a response to Durston,” Religious     Studies 39, pp. 451-458.
    • An objection to the defense of skeptical theism by appeal to complexity.
  • Van Inwagen, P. (2003) The Problem of Evil (Oxford University Press).
    • A clear presentation of the argument from evil (§2) and an example of a defense.
  • Wilks, I. (2009) “Skeptical Theism and Empirical Unfalsifiability,” Faith & Philosophy 26:1, pp. 64-76.
    • An objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for everyday knowledge.
  • Wykstra, S. (1984) “The Humean Obstacle to Evidential Arguments from Suffering: On Avoiding the Evils of ‘Appearance’,” International Journal of Philosophy of Religion 16, pp. 73-93.
    • A defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises.

Author Information

Justin P. McBrayer
Fort Lewis College
U. S. A.

The Trinity

Christians believe that God is a Trinity of Persons, each omnipotent, omniscient and wholly benevolent, co-equal and fully divine. There are not three gods, however, but one God in three Persons: Father, Son and Holy Spirit. Prima facie, the doctrine more commonly known as the Trinity seems gratuitous: why multiply divine beings beyond necessity—especially since one God is hard enough to believe in? For Christians, however, the Trinity doctrine is neither gratuitous nor unmotivated. Claims about Christ’s divinity are difficult to reconcile with the Christian doctrine that there is just one God: Trinitarian theology is an attempt to square the Christian conviction that Jesus is the Son of God, fully divine yet distinct from his Father, with the Christian commitment to monotheism. Nevertheless, while the Trinity doctrine purports to solve a range of theological puzzles it poses a number of intriguing logical difficulties akin to those suggested by the identity of spatio-temporal objects through time and across worlds, puzzle cases of personal identity, and problems of identity and constitution. Philosophical discussions of the Trinity have suggested solutions to the Trinity puzzle comparable to solutions proposed to these classic identity puzzles. When it comes to the Trinity puzzle, however, one must determine whether such solutions accord with theological constraints.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Motivation
    1. Why Should One Believe It?
    2. God and World: The Great Chain of Being and the Bright Line
    3. Trinity East and West: Loose and Descending or Tight and Flat?
    4. The Industry Standard: Nicea and Beyond
  2. Theological Constraints
    1. Monotheism
    2. The Distinctness of Persons
    3. The Equality of Persons, the Descending Trinity and the Filioque Clause
    4. Personality
    5. Christology and the Jesus Predicate Problem
  3. Philosophical Puzzles and Solutions
    1. Trinity and Identity
    2. The "Is" of Predication
    3. Divine Stuff: 'God' as a Mass Term
    4. Relative Identity
    5. The Trinity and Other Identity Puzzles
  4. References and Further Reading

1. History and Motivation

a. Why Should One Believe It?

Why should one believe that God is a Trinity of Persons? Historically, most writers have held that even if the existence of God could be known by natural reason, his Trinitarian character could only be discovered through revelation.  Such revelations in the tradition of the Church can only be indirectly encountered through the explication and interpretation of Scripture. This was, for example, Aquinas’ view. However, other writers have suggested that even discounting revelation, reflection on the nature of God should lead us to recognize his Trinitarian character. For instance, Richard Swinburne argues that there is at least a plausibility argument for a Trinity of divine persons insofar as God’s perfectly loving nature drives the production of the Trinitarian Persons:

I believe that there is overriding reason for a first divine individual to bring about a second divine individual and with him to bring about a third divine individual…[L]ove is a supreme good. Love involves sharing, giving to the other what of one’s own is good for him and receiving from the other what of his is good for one; and love involves co-operating with another to benefit third parties. [Richard Swinburne, The Christian God, p. 177-178]

However, this is a minority view, as other contemporary writers reject a prioriarguments for the doctrine of the Trinity.  For example, Brian Leftow challenges it by asking why perfect love should stop at three rather than four or more.

If natural reason fails to provide a compelling reason to regard God as Trinitarian, an appeal to Scripture does not fare much better. There are few hints in the Bible of the Trinity doctrine, which developed later during the Patristic period. The Trinitarian formula figures in injunctions to baptize “in the name of the Father, Son and Holy Spirit” in Matthew 28:19, but both twofold and threefold patterns occur in the New Testament, and there is no mention of the Trinity as such. Rausch in The Trinitarian Controversy notes:

The binatarian formulas are found in Rom 8:11, 2 Cor. 4:14, Gal. 1:1, Eph. 1:20, 1 Tim. 1:2, 1 Pet. 1:21 and 2 John 1:13. The triadic schema is discovered in Matt. 28:19, 1 Cor. 6:11 and 12:4, Gal. 3:11-14, Heb. 10:29, and 1 Pet. 1:2. All these passages indicate that there is no fixity of wording. No doctrine of the Trinity in the Nicene sense is present in the New Testament. (William G. Rusch. The Trinitarian Controversy. Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1980. P. 2)

Despite this ambiguity, the Gospels do pose puzzles that motivate the development of Trinitarian doctrine. First, they represent Jesus as both the Son of Man, who prays to the Father, and as a divine being, identified in the Fourth Gospel with the Logos, who is “with God and is God,” [John 1:1] and who also announces that he and the Father are “one” [John 10:30]. Second, Scripture speaks of the Spirit who descended on Jesus’ disciples at Pentecost, and who also is conventionally identified with the Spirit that moved over the waters at Creation in Genesis. Arguably, we may regard the Trinity doctrine as an explanatory hypothesis, which purports to make sense of divinity claims concerning the Son and Holy Spirit without undermining the Judeo-Christian commitment to monotheism.

b. God and World: The Great Chain of Being and the Bright Line

The Trinity doctrine is also part of a larger theological project. In the early Christian Era of the Hebrew tradition, there was a plurality of divine, semi-divine and otherwise supernatural beings, which has to be reconciled with Hebraic monotheism. Some of these beings, such as Yahweh’s suite of Seraphim and Cherubim, are indigenous; others were absorbed from Hellenistic religious culture. In the interests of an orderly theological monotheism, these beings have to be defined in relation to God. Some were absorbed into the Godhead as aspects, powers or components of the one God, others were demoted to angelic or demonic status, and yet others were dismissed as the mere hypostatizations of theological façons de parler. The doctrine of the Trinity emerged as part of that theological tidying up process, which, from the Judeo-Christian side, was aimed at drawing a bright line between the one God and everything else.

If Jews and Christians (insofar as they were faithful to their Hebraic roots), were intent on separating out the one God from all other things visible and invisible, Greeks had no compunction about multiplying supernatural beings. Indeed, the Greek problem of “the one and the many” was one of filling the gap between a simple, impassible, atemporal, incorporeal, incorruptible deity and a world of matter, the passive recipient of form, which was temporal, corporeal, and corruptible.

The traditional response was to introduce one or more divine, semi-divine or otherwise supernatural beings to mediate between the One and the many. So Plato, in the Timaeus, speculated that the material world had been created by the Demiurge, a Second God. This strategy was elaborated upon during the late Hellenistic period in Gnostic systems, which introduced elaborate systems of “emanations” from the divine in a continuum, a Great Chain of Being that stretched from the most elevated of beings, through intermediaries, and to those who were sufficiently remote from full divinity to be involved with the world of matter. During the Hellenistic period, Christians and Jews engaged in philosophical theology, like Origen and Philo, adopted similar views since Philosophy was of the Greeks, and the philosophical lingua franca was Platonism.

In contrast, there was no reason to construct a Great Chain of Being within the Hebrew tradition. The writers of Hebrew Scripture did not have any compelling philosophical interests and did not look for mechanisms to explain how things came into being or operated: fiat was good enough. Perhaps more importantly, they did not view materiality as inherently imperfect or defective and so did not need to posit mediating beings to bridge an ontological gap between the divine and base matter, a feature of the Greek tradition. This tradition, though it continued to figure in popular piety, was officially repudiated by orthodox Christians. Yahweh, according to the Genesis accounts, created the world by fiat—no mechanism required—and saw that it was good.

For philosophical theologians in the grip of the problem of the One and the many, fiat would not do—and for Christian theologians, committed to monotheism, the doctrine of mediating divine or semi-divine beings posed special difficulties. As heirs to the Hebrew tradition, they recognized a fundamental ontological dividing line between a divine Creator and his creation and faced the problem of which side of the line the mediating being or beings occupied—exacerbated by the monotheistic assumption that there was only room for one Being on the side of the Creator.

c. Trinity East and West: Loose and Descending or Tight and Flat?

The Trinity Doctrine was an attempt to accommodate both partisans of the Bright Line and also partisans of the Great Chain of Being including Christians who identified Jesus with the Logos, a mediating divine being through which the material world was created. Jews wanted to absorb all divine beings into the one God in the interests of promoting monotheism; Greeks wanted mediating beings to bridge the ontological gap between the world of time and change, and the transcendent reality beyond. In identifying the Logos, incarnate in Christ, as the Second Person of the Trinity, Christians aimed to bridge the ontological gap with a mediating being who was himself incorporated into the Godhead, satisfying the metaphysical interests of both Greeks and Jews.

Elaborated over three centuries before reaching its mature form in the ecumenical councils of Nicea (325 AD) and Constantinople (381 AD), the doctrine of the Trinity represents an attempt to organize and make sense of the Christian conviction that God created the material world, sustained it and acted within history, most particularly through Christ and in his Church. On this account, God creates all things through the Logos and enters into the world in Christ. Jesus promises that he will not abandon his people but that after ascending to his Father will send the Holy Spirit to guide his Church. The Logos and Holy Spirit are not merely supernatural beings of an inferior order who do God’s business in the world: according to the Biblical tradition the material world is not an inferior realm to be handled by inferior mediating beings. Accordingly, Christians needed to hold that the Logos and Holy Spirit were fully divine. To preserve monotheism, however, there could not be divine beings other than God, so Christians were pressed to incorporate the Logos and Holy Spirit into the divine nature.

The tension between those two theological interests shaped the ongoing development of Trinitarian doctrine insofar as the goal of Christian orthodoxy was to make sense of the role of Christ as a mediating divine being—God with us, the Word made flesh through which all things were made—while maintaining the bright line between a transcendent, divine being and everything else in the interests of supporting monotheism. Painting with a broad brush, the former concern drove the development of Trinitarian doctrine that evolved into the Eastern tradition of Social Trinitarianism; the latter shaped the theology of Latin Trinitarianism that came to dominate the West.

Social Trinitarians, in the interests of explaining Christ’s mediating role, conceive of the Trinity as a divine society, each member of which is fully personal, each a center of consciousness, each involved in a loving relationship with the others. This view puts pressure on monotheism; however, advocates suggest that the cost is worth it in order to accommodate what they regard as compelling religious interests. Scripture represents Christ as communicating interpersonally with his Father, praying and being commended as the Son with whom his Father is well pleased. Social Trinitarians regard this sort of relationship as religiously important insofar as it models, in an ideal form, the relationship between God and us, and also between us and our fellows. In addition, the picture of the Trinity as a loving divine society makes sense of the notion of God as Love. For Social Trinitarians, in any case, the fundamental problem is one of making sense of the unity of Persons in one divine Being and this is, indeed, the project of the theologians credited with being the progenitors of Social Trinitarianism: the Cappadocian Fathers, Basil, Gregory of Nazianzus and Gregory of Nyssa.

Latin Trinitarians, by contrast, begin with the God’s unity as given and seek to explain how the Persons may be distinguished one from another. If Social Trinitarians understand the Trinity as a society of Persons, Latin Trinitarians represent the Trinity in toto as an individual and imagine the Persons generated in some manner by the relations among them. In this vein, St. Augustine suggests that the Trinity is analogous to the mind, its knowledge of itself and love of itself, which are distinct but inseparable (Augustine, On the Trinity). Nevertheless, while Latin Trinitarianism makes monotheism unproblematic, it poses difficulties concerning the apparently interpersonal communication between Jesus and his Father, and in addition raises questions about how the Persons, in particular the Holy Spirit, can be understood as personal.

Although Social Trinitarianism and Latin Trinitarianism fall within the scope of Nicene orthodoxy, it may be instructive to consider the difference in heterodox views that emerge in the East and West. When Social Trinitarianism goes bad it degrades into Subordinationism, a family of doctrines that assign an inferiority of being, status or role to the Son and Holy Spirit within the Trinity, which has its roots in the emanationist theologies that proliferated in the Hellenistic world. This view is classically represented in the theology of the heresiarch Arius, who held that the Son was a mere creature, albeit “the first-born of all creation.” Eastern theology tends towards a “loose,” descending Trinity, to tri-theism and subordinationism and so Arianism is the characteristic Eastern heresy.

Western theology, by contrast favors a “tight,” flat Trinity and in the first centuries of the Christian era tended toward ultra-high Christologies like Apollinarianism, the doctrine that, crudely, Jesus was a man in whom the Logos took the place normally occupied by a human rational soul, and Monophytism, according to which Christ had only one nature, and that divine. If the characteristic Trinitarian heresy in the East was Arianism, the characteristic Western heresies belong to a family of heterodox views generically known as Monarchianism, a term coined by Tertullian to designate tight-Trinity doctrines in virtue of their emphasis on the unity of God as the single and only ruler or source of Being, including most notably Modalism (a.k.a. Sabellianism), the doctrine that the Persons of the Trinity are merely “modes,” aspects or offices of the one God.

d. The Industry Standard: Nicea and Beyond

There is enough doctrinal space between Arianianism and Sabellianism to accommodate a range of theological accounts of the Trinity within the scope of Nicene orthodoxy. The Nicene formula declared that the Son was homoousios, “of the same substance” as the Father, which was elaborated by the Cappadocian Fathers in the dictum that the Persons of the Trinity were one ousia but three hypostases. This knocked out Arians on the one side and Sabellians on the other, but left room for a range of interpretations in between since “ousia” was, notoriously, ambiguous. Aristotle had used the term to designate both individuals, substances that are bearers of essences and properties, and the essential natures of individuals, the natural kinds in virtue of which they are substances in the first sense. So, individual human beings are substances in the first sense, and the human nature they share, the natural kind to which they belong, is a substance in the second sense.

The Nicene homoousios formula inherited the ambiguity. Understood in one way, the claim that the Persons of the Trinity were “homoousios” said that the Persons were the same individual, skating dangerously close to the Sabellian claim that they were “monoousios”—of one substance. Understood in the other way, it said merely that they were of the same kind, an interpretation compatible with tri-theism. The Cappadocians attempted to clarify and disambiguate the Nicene formula by employing the term “hypostasis,” used earlier by Origen, to capture the notion of individual identity rather than identity of kind. By itself, this did not solve the problem. First, apart from their revisionary theological usage, ousia and hypostasis were virtual synonyms: as a solution to the Trinity puzzle this formula was rather like saying that the Persons were one thing but different objects. Secondly, “one ousia” still failed to rule out tri-theism—indeed, in non-theological cases, one ousia, many hypostases is precisely what different individuals of the same species are. Homoousios, as intended, ruled out the doctrine that Father and Son were merely similar kinds of beings—homoiousios—but it did not rule out their being distinct individuals of the same kind.

The Cappadocian dictum, however, provided a framework for further discussion of the Trinity puzzle: the Trinitarian Persons were to be understood as being the same something but different something-elses and the substantive theological question was that of characterizing the ways in which they were bound together and individuated.

As to the latter question, Nicea opened the discussion of the “theology” of the Trinity, understood as the exploration of the relations amongst Persons—the “immanent Trinity” as distinct from the “economic Trinity,” that is the Trinity understood in terms of the distinct roles of the Persons in their worldly activities, in creation, redemption and sanctification. Nicea cashed out the homoousios claim by noting that the Son was “begotten, not made” indicating that he was, as noted in a parallel formula then current, “out of the Father’s ousia.” Furthermore, the Holy Spirit was declared at Constantinople to have the same sort of ontological status as the Son. So in the Fourth Century, at the Councils of Nicea and Constantinople, and through the work of the Cappadocians, the agenda for Trinitarian theology was set and the boundaries of orthodoxy were marked.

Within these parameters, the Trinity doctrine poses problems of three sorts: first, theological problems in reconciling theological doctrines concerning the character and properties of God with Trinitarian claims; secondly, theological puzzles that arise from Christological claims in particular; and finally logical puzzles posed by the Trinity doctrine itself. It remains to be seen whether it is possible to formulate a coherent doctrine of the Trinity within the constraints of Christian orthodoxy.

2. Theological Constraints

a. Monotheism

Christians claim to be monotheists and yet, given the doctrine of the Trinity, hold that there are three beings who are fully divine, viz. God the Father, Son and Holy Spirit. The first Trinity puzzle is that of explaining how we can attribute full divinity to the Persons of the Trinity without either compromising monotheism or undermining claims about the distinctness of Trinitarian persons.

Orthodox accounts of the Trinity hover uneasily between Sabellianism—which construes Trinitarian Persons as mere phases, aspects or offices of one God—and tri-theism, according to which the Persons are three Gods. Tri-theism is unacceptable since it is incompatible with the historical Christian commitment to monotheism inherited from the Hebrew tradition.

The fundamental problem for Trinitarian orthodoxy is to develop a doctrine of the Trinity that fits in the space between Sabellianism (or other versions of Monarchianism) and tri-theism. For Social Trinitarians in particular the problem has been one of articulating an account of the Trinity that affirms the individuality of the Persons and their relationships with one another without lapsing into tri-theism.

b. The Distinctness of Persons

Historically, Monarchianism—in particular Modalism (or Sabellianism), the doctrine that the Persons are “modes,” aspects, or roles of God—has been more tempting to Christians than tri-theism. The fundamental problem orthodox Latin Trinitarians face is that of maintaining a distinction between Trinitarian Persons sufficient to avoid Sabellianism, since orthodox Christians hold that the Persons of the Trinity are not merely aspects of God or God under different descriptions but in some sense distinct individuals such that Father ≠ Son ≠ Holy Spirit.

Christians hold that there are properties that distinguish the Persons. First, there are intra–Trinitarian relational properties the Persons have in virtue of their relations to other Trinitarian Persons: the Father begets the Son, but the Son does not beget the Son; the Spirit proceeds from the Father (and the Son) but neither the Father nor the Son proceeds from the Father (and the Son). Secondly, the Persons of the Trinity are distinguished in virtue of their distinctive “missions”—their activities in the world. The Second Person of the Trinity becomes incarnate, is born, suffers, dies, is buried, rises from the dead and ascends to the Father. According to orthodox doctrine, however, the same is not true of the Father (or Holy Spirit) and, indeed, the doctrine that the Father became incarnate, suffered and died is the heresy of patripassionism.

According to Latin Trinitarians, God, the Trinity, is an individual rather than a community of individuals sharing the same divine nature and each Person of the Trinity is that individual. Given this account however, the trick is to block inferences from the ascription of properties characteristic of one Trinitarian Person to the ascription of those properties to other Persons. Moreover, since it is held that the Persons cannot be individuated by their worldly activities, Latin Trinitarians, whose project is to explain the distinctions between Persons, must develop an account of the intra–Trinitarian relations that distinguish them—a project which is at best speculative.

c. The Equality of Persons, the Descending Trinity and the Filioque Clause

Supposing that we tread the fine line, and succeed in affirming both the participation of Trinitarian Persons in one God and their distinctness. Orthodoxy then requires, in addition, that we hold the Persons of the Trinity to be equal in power, knowledge, goodness and all properties pertaining to divinity other than those that are specific to the Persons individually. This poses problems when it comes to divine agency. Assuming that doing A and doing A* are equally good, it is logically possible that one Person may prefer A while another prefers A* (and that the third is, perhaps, indifferent). In the absence of a tie-breaker, it is hard to see how the Trinity can get anything done! If the Person who prefers A and the Person who prefers A* stick to their guns, neither can accomplish his end so it would seem, neither can count as omnipotent; if they defer to one another they also end up in a deadlock.

This is a difficulty for Social Trinitarians in particular insofar as they understand the Trinitarian Persons as distinct centers of consciousness and will whose projects might be incompatible. Swinburne, a Social Trinitarian, attempts to avoid this difficulty by suggesting that the Father, in virtue of his character as the Source of Trinitarian Persons, has the authority to “lay down the rules” so that irresolvable conflicts amongst Trinitarian Persons will be avoided (Swinburne, pp. 172-173). If however we assume that the preferences of one Trinitarian person take precedence so that the other Persons willingly defer to him as a matter of policy, then it is hard to avoid the suspicion that some Persons of the Trinity are “more equal than others”—the heresy of Subordinationism.

Even if Social Trinitarians avoid Subordinationism, the descending account of the Trinity according to which the defining characteristic of the Father is that of being the Source of Trinitarian Persons has theological ramifications which, in the end, resulted in the defining controversy between Eastern and Western churches concerning the Filioque clause. The original version of the Creed formulated by the councils of Nicea and Constantinople, declares that the Holy Spirit proceeds from the Father (ek tou Patros ek poreuomenon). The Filioque Clause, affirming that the Holy Spirit proceeds from the Father and the Son (ex Patri Filioque procedit), which first appeared in the profession of faith formulated at the Council of Toledo in 589, spread throughout Gaul and eventually become normative in the West, was firmly rejected by the Eastern churches on the grounds that it undermined the doctrine that the Father was the Source of Trinitarian Persons and the personality of the Holy Spirit.

Photios, the 9th Century Patriarch of Constantinople who initiated the Photian Schism between East and West, argues in The Mystogogy of the Holy Spirit that the procession of the Holy Spirit from the Son as well as the Father implies that the Father is not up to the task of generating Trinitarian Persons. Either the Father can do the job on his own or he can’t. If he can, then the participation of the Son in the generation of the Holy Spirit is superfluous and so there is no reason to accept the Filioque Clause. If he can’t, then he is a theological failure, which is absurd. Photios, representing the Eastern tradition, assumes a descending account of the Trinity according to which the characteristic hypostatic property of the Father is his role as the Source of the other Trinitarian Persons. He assumes in addition that all properties of Trinitarian Persons are such that they are either generic properties of divinity, and so are shared by all Persons, or hypostatic properties possessed uniquely by the Persons they characterize. It follows from these assumptions that the Filioque Clause should be rejected.

Photios and other Eastern theologians worried also that the Western account of the Trinity undermined the personal character of the Holy Spirit. According to one metaphor, widely employed in the West, the Father, Son and Holy Spirit are analogous to the Lover, the Beloved and the Love between them. Love is not the sort of thing that can have psychological properties or count as a person and so Eastern theologians charged that the “flat” Trinitarian picture that dominated Western Trinitarian theology, in which the Holy Spirit was understood as a relation or mediator between Father and Son undermined the personhood of the Holy Spirit.

Is the “descending” picture at the heart of Eastern Trinitarian theology, according to which the Father is characteristically the progenitor of Trinitarian Persons, inherently subordinationist? It does not seem to be so since there is no compelling reason why we should regard the property of being the Source of Trinitarian persons as one that confers superior status or authority on its possessor. Some parents are smarter, better looking, and richer than their children; others are dumber, uglier, and poorer. When children are young their parents legitimately exercise authority over them; when they are grown up they become their parents’ peers. To the extent that the role of the Father as the Source of Trinitarian Persons is analogous to human parenthood there is no reason to regard the Father as in any respect superior to the other Persons and it is hard to see what other reason could be given for this view.

Nevertheless, the descending Trinity picture lends itself to subordinatist interpretations in a way that the flat Trinity model does not. So when, for example, Swinburne suggests that the Father’s essential character as Source of Trinitarian Persons confers on him the authority to resolve intra–Trinitarian disputes or entitles him to the deference of other Trinitarian Persons he is, at the very least, skating close to the edge of Subordinationism.

d. Personality

Finally, Christians hold that God is personal—the subject of psychological states. But what is personal: the Trinity in toto or the Persons individually? The Litany, which addresses the Persons individually, and the Trinity in toto suggests all of the above:

O God the Father, Creator of heaven and earth; Have mercy upon us.
O God the Son, Redeemer of the world; Have mercy upon us.
O God the Holy Ghost, Sanctifier of the faithful; Have mercy upon us.
O holy, blessed, and glorious Trinity, one God: Have mercy upon us.

But this does not seem to be a coherent position. If the Father, Son and Holy Spirit are distinct centers of consciousness, the sorts of beings to whom one can reasonably appeal for mercy, and the Trinity is a divine society as Social Trinitarians suggest, it would seem that the Trinity could not itself be personal in any robust sense. After invoking the Father, Son and Holy Ghost, the invocation of the Trinity seems superfluous—as if I were to ask permission to build a fence on our adjoining property lines from each of my neighbors and then get them together to ask permission of them as a group.

On the face of it Latin Trinitarians have an easier time explaining what is personal: it is God, the Trinity and the Persons are individually personal to the extent that each is God. The Father is God so insofar as God, the Trinity, is personal, the Father is personal; the Son and Holy Spirit are God so they too are personal. The invocations in the Litany are indeed redundant because all four invoke no one other than God, but that is just a matter of poetic license. Nevertheless, some Christians, in particular Eastern Christians who are sympathetic to the Social Trinitarianism, worry that some metaphors Latin Trinitarians exploit undermine the personal character of the Holy Spirit. In addition, Latin Trinitarianism makes Gospel accounts of Jesus’ praying to the Father difficult to make out. Who was praying to whom? On the Latin Trinitarian account it seems that, insofar as we identify Jesus with the Second Person of the Trinity, God was simply talking to himself.

e. Christology and the Jesus Predicate Problem

The doctrine of the Trinity, as noted earlier, is motivated by the Christian conviction that Jesus was, in some sense, divine. Jesus however was born, suffered under Pontius Pilate, was crucified, died and was buried; he did not understand Chinese; he believed that David was the author of all the Psalms. These properties are, it would seem, incompatible with divinity and, indeed, there appear to be a great many predicates that are true of Jesus which, it would seem, could not be true of God and vice versa.

This is the Jesus Predicate Problem: we do not want to ascribe all the predicates that are true of Jesus to God simpliciter or, in particular, to God the Father. We do not, for example, want to hold that the Father suffered on the Cross—the heresy of Patripassionism. God, as traditionally understood is impassible—he cannot be subject to suffering, pain or harm. Moreover God has no beginning in time or end, and is, according to most orthodox accounts atemporal insofar as he is eternal rather than merely everlasting: he exists outside of time in what is, from the perspective of his subjectivity, the eternal now. Jesus however was born at a particular time and lived his life in time, so to maintain God’s atemporality, we cannot allow predicates that assign temporal properties to Jesus to God, or in particular to God the Father. In general, there are a range of predicates that are true of Jesus that, we want to hold, are not true of God the Father or of the Holy Spirit, and which we would hesitate to ascribe to God simpliciter insofar as they appear to be inconsistent with essential features of divinity.

To avoid the migration of Jesus’ predicates to other Persons of the Trinity, we need to create enough logical space between the Persons to block inferences from claims about Jesus to claims about the Father so that, in general, “Jesus Fs” does not entail “God the Father Fs” where “x Fs” says either that x has a property, is a certain kind of thing or does a certain kind of action. The trouble with Monarchian accounts, which make the Trinity “too tight,” is that they obliterate the logical space between the Persons that would block such inferences. Since Monarchians cannot use Trinitarian doctrine to block these inferences they use Christology to do the job—by either adopting very high Christologies or very low ones.  The wedge has to be driven somewhere and, if there isn’t enough logical space to drive it in between the First and Second Persons of the Trinity, it has to go in between the Second Person, the divine Logos which is from the beginning with God and is God, and whatever it is that is the subject of Jesus predicates.

One way to do this is via an ultra-high Christology according to which the troublesome Jesus predicates aren’t literally true of Christ the divine Logos but are true of something else—the human body he animates, a mere appearance or an imposter. To see how this works, consider Apollarianism, an ultra-high Christology rejected at the Council of Constantinople in 381 and again at the Council of Chalcedon in 451 at which Christological doctrine was formulated. According to this heterodox view, the historical Jesus was a human being who had the Logos plugged into the place that would normally be occupied by a human rational soul. Christ is the Logos and, insofar we ascribe such Jesus predicates as “___ suffered under Pontius Pilate,” “___ was crucified,” “___ died” and “___ was buried” that is merely a façon de parler. Strictly speaking, what these predicates are true of is not Christ but only of the body he used for a time to conduct his worldly operations. Consequently, they do not pass to the Logos or to other Persons of the Trinity, so there is no problem.

The other way to drive the wedge between the Father and the bearer of Jesus predicates is by adopting an ultra-low Christology, that is, by kicking Christ out of the Godhead altogether. Historically, this is the tack taken by Adoptionists who held that the man Jesus became “Son of God” only by adoption and grace dispensed at by God at his baptism, and the view held by contemporary quasi-Christians who deny the divinity of Christ. If Christ, the bearer of Jesus predicates is not divine, problematic Jesus predicates do not pass to the Father, or to God simpliciter, so there is no problem.

Interestingly, Christians have historically rejected ultra-high Christologies on the grounds that they undermine soteriology. This concern was articulated by Gregory of Nazianzus in his critique of Apollinarianism by the dictum “non assumptus, non salus.” The idea is that God’s aim in becoming incarnate was to assume human nature in order to heal it—if Christ only seemed to be human that could not be accomplished. And if he only took on a human body and its vegetative and animal souls—the principles responsible for life, growth, locomotion and emotion—but not the rational soul of a human being, he would have left out the very component of humanness that was in need of healing, since it was precisely man’s rational nature that was corrupted by sin. Anselm makes the same point in Cur Deus Homo? Whatever we think of this sort of argument it was for this reason that Christians worried about Christologies that failed to recognize the full humanity of Christ.

Christians who could not accept either ultra-high or ultra-low Christologies attempted to circumvent the Jesus Predicate Problem by rejecting the ultra-tight Monarchian view of the Trinity. So, writing more than a century before Nicea, Hippolytus suggested that Hereclitean contradictions could be avoided by a Trinitarian doctrine that created enough logical space between the Persons to block inferences from the character of Christ, the Second Person of the Trinity, to claims about the character of the other Persons, the Father in particular. With sufficient logical space between the Persons, Christ’s vincibility, mortality and other properties that are prima facie incompatible with divinity or unworthy of a deity can be segregated so that they don’t transfer to the Father. Given a Subordinationist account on the descending model according to which the Second Person is a semi-divine mediating figure there is no problem assigning troublesome Jesus predicates to him.

The trouble is that once committed to the Nicene doctrine that Christ is wholly divine, consubstantial with and equal to the Father, “God of God, Light of Light, very God of very God,” the same problem arises all over again for the Second Person of the Trinity! If ascribing these properties to the Father is bad, ascribing them to the Son thus understood is just as bad. Historically, the Church’s way with Jesus predicate problems that threaten the doctrine of the Trinity has been to recharacterize them as Christological problems concerning the relation between Christ’s divine and human natures—which are beyond the scope of this essay.

We may ask however whether, once the Church’s Trinity theologians circumvent the Jesus Predicate Problem by passing the buck to the Christologists, there is any reason to worry about Modalism or other tight-Trinity doctrines that minimize the logical space between Persons. As we have seen, historically, the rationale for rejecting Sabellianism was the worry that it did not leave enough space to drive a wedge between Father and Son that would block inferences from “Jesus Fs” to “God the Father Fs.” If however we can contrive a theological account that blocks such inferences Christologically, by driving the wedge between the bearer of Jesus predicates and the Second Person of the Trinity—by, e.g. distinguishing between Christ’s divine and human natures or between Christ qua human and Christ qua God—then there is no particular reason to worry about the space between Trinitarian Persons, and so it may be that Sabellianism is a more attractive proposition than it was initially through to be.

3. Philosophical Puzzles and Solutions

For Christians, at least in the West, Quincunque Vult, commonly known as the Athanasian Creed, defines Trinitarian orthodoxy as follows:

We worship one God in Trinity, and Trinity in Unity, neither confounding the Persons, nor dividing the Substance
For there is one Person of the Father, another of the Son, and another of the Holy Ghost…
Such as the Father is, such is the Son, and such is the Holy Ghost…
[T]he Father is God, the Son is God, and the Holy Ghost is God.
And yet they are not three Gods, but one God

Christians are thus committed to the following claims:

(1) The Father is God

(2) The Son is God

(3) The Holy Spirit is God

(4) The Father is not the Son

(5) The Father is not the Holy Spirit

(6) The Son is not the Holy Spirit

(7) There is exactly one God

a. Trinity and Identity

Can one consistently believe (1) – (7)? It depends on how we read the “is” in (1) – (6). If we read it throughout as the “is” of strict identity, as “=” the answer is no. Identity is an equivalence relation: it is reflexive, symmetric and transitive, which is to say, for all x, y and z the following hold:

Reflexivity:           x = x

Symmetry:            If x = y then y = x

Transitivity:          If x = y and y = z then x = y

In addition, identity is an unrestricted indiscernibilty relation for all properties, which is to say it obeys Leibniz’ Law, understood as the Indiscernibility of Identicals:

LL:                         If x = y then for all properties, P, x has P if and only if y has P

This is bad news. Suppose we read the “is” as “=” in (1) – (6). Then it follows from (1) and (2), by symmetry and transitivity, that the Father is the Son, which contradicts (4). Put another way, given LL, (1) entails that God has all the same properties as the Father, including the property of being identical with the Father insofar as everything has the property of self-identity. (2) says that the Son likewise has all the same properties as God. It follows that, since God has the property of being identical with the Son, the Son also has the property of being identical with the Father, which contradicts (4).

These formal features of identity are non-negotiable in the way that the four-sidedness of squares is: God cannot evade them any more than he can make a square with only three sides. God can make triangles—and pentagons, chiliagons or figures with any number of sides he pleases—but he cannot make such things squares. So, assuming that “God,” “Father,” “Son” and “Holy Spirit” don’t change their reference, the “is” that figures in (1) – (6) cannot be the “is” of strict identity.

b. The "Is" of Predication

In English, most of the time the word “is” occurs it does not express an identity. The “is” that occurs in (8) and (9) is the “is” of predication: it is used to ascribe a property to an object:

(8) Ducati is a dog.

(9) Ducati is canine.

(8) is not an identity statement because “a dog” does not pick out a particular object. Identity is a relation between objects; in particular, it is the relation that everything bears to itself and to no other thing. In a true identity statement the nouns or noun phrases on either sides of the identity pick out the very same thing. (10) and (11) are true identity statements:

(10) Ducati is the chocolate Lab at 613 Second Avenue.

(11) Ducati is Britynic Cadbury of Bourneville

“The chocolate Lab at 613 Second Avenue” and “Britynic Cadbury of Bourneville” each pick out particular dog, as it happens, the same dog that “Ducati” picks out but “a dog” does not. (8) in fact says the same thing as (9)—it says that Ducati has the property of being a dog, that is the property of being canine. The “is” in (8), like the “is” in (9) is therefore, the “is” of predication.

Now consider (1) – (3) understanding the “is” that occurs in each sentence as the “is” of predication to yield:

(1') The Father is a God

(2') The Son is a God

(3') The Holy Spirit is a God

The “is” of predication does not express an equivalence relation and, in general, “x has P” and “y has P” do not imply “x is identical to y.” Ducati is a dog and Riley is a dog but it does not follow that Ducati is (identical to) Riley—in fact they are not. Similarly, (1') and (2') do not imply that the Father is the Son so there is no contradiction.

However, (1') – (3') just say that the Father, Son and Holy Spirit are each divine, in the way that (8) just says that Ducati is canine, and this leaves open the possibility that there are two, or three Gods involved. They do not explain what makes the Persons one God or provide any rationale for (7). Furthermore, together with (4) – (6) it seems to follow that there are indeed three Gods, just as it follows from “Ducati is a dog,” “Riley is a dog” and “Ducati is not Riley” that there are (at least) two dogs.

This is the concern Gregory of Nyssa addressed in his response to Ablabius, who worried that understanding the unity of Trinitarian persons in terms of their sharing the property of divinity implied Tri-theism:

The argument which you state is something like this: Peter, James, and John, being in one human nature, are called three men: and there is no absurdity in describing those who are united in nature, if they are more than one, by the plural number of the name derived from their nature. If, then, in the above case, custom admits this, and no one forbids us to speak of those who are two as two, or those who are more than two as three, how is it that in the case of our statements of the mysteries of the Faith, though confessing the Three Persons, and acknowledging no difference of nature between them, we are in some sense at variance with our confession, when we say that the Godhead of the Father and of the Son and of the Holy Ghost is one, and yet forbid men to say “there are three Gods”? The question is, as I said, very difficult to deal with. (Gregory of Nyssa, “To Ablabius”)

This is a difficult question indeed.

c. Divine Stuff: 'God' as a Mass Term

Gregory proposed the following analogy by way of a solution:

That which is not thus circumscribed is not enumerated, and that which is not enumerated cannot be contemplated in multitude. For we say that gold, even though it be cut into many figures, is one, and is so spoken of, but we speak of many coins or many staters, without finding any multiplication of the nature of gold by the number of staters; and for this reason we speak of gold, when it is contemplated in greater bulk, either in plate or in coin, as “much,” but we do not speak of it as “many golds” on account of the multitude of the material,-except when one says there are “many gold pieces” (Darics, for instance, or staters), in which case it is not the material, but the pieces of money to which the significance of number applies: indeed, properly, we should not call them “gold” but “golden.” As, then, the golden staters are many, but the gold is one, so too those who are exhibited to us severally in the nature of man, as Peter, James, and John, are many, yet the man in them is one. (Gregory of Nyssa. “To Ablabius”)

What Gregory has noticed here is that “gold” is a mass term rather than a count noun. Mass terms have a number of features that distinguish them from count nouns: in particular, they do not take plural, so to that extent as Gregory remarks, “gold…is one.” Intuitively, count nouns designate “things” while mass terms designate “stuffs”—gold, water, oatmeal and the like.

However, Gregory has inferred that human nature and, by analogy, divinity, should be understood as stuff too so that, just as there is one gold, parceled up into bits that are not properly speaking “gold” but merely golden there is just one man parceled up into bits each of which is not, properly speaking, man but merely human.

Richard Cartwright dismisses this solution very quickly as desperate, heretical and unhelpful:

It seems to have been left to Gregory of Nyssa, Basil's younger brother, to notice that, thus understood, consubstantiality of the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit appears to license saying that there are three Gods.  Gregory himself rather desperately suggested that strictly speaking there is only one man. But besides being itself heretical, the suggestion is of no help. (Richard Cartwright. “On the Logical Problem of the Trinity” in Richard Cartwright, Philosophical Essays. MIT Press, 1987. P. 171)

Nevertheless, it may be possible to push a little further along this line. Even though, intuitively, we think of mass nouns as designating more or less homogeneous stuffs, without perceptible, discrete but continuous parts, mass noun is a grammatical category and does not determine the character of what it designates but how we talk about it. The designata of some mass nouns have quite large, readily perceptible discrete parts. Consider “fruit” which, in English typically functions as a mass noun: the plural form, “fruits” is not ill-formed but it is rare and occurs primarily in idioms like “by their fruits ye shall know them”; we say “a lot of fruit” but only rarely “a few fruits” or “many fruits.” Perhaps most tellingly “fruit” takes what are called “sortalizing auxiliary nouns,” devices that attach to mass terms to yield noun phrases that behave like +count nouns: so we talk about “bodies of water,” “piles of sand” and, tellingly, “pieces of fruit.” From the grammatical point of view, Gregory’s revisionary proposal is in order: we can by an act of linguistic legislation decide to treat, perhaps for convenience, “human” as a mass term designating a spatially extended but gappy object, so that Peter, James and John are not, properly speaking, humans but rather pieces of humanity, a stuff which consists of Peter, James, John and all their fellows pooled together.

Perhaps the Trinity can be fixed by an account along the lines of Gregory’s proposal, according to which we may understand the God as a concrete but non-spatio-temporal whole, whose simple, non-spatio-temporal parts are the Trinitarian Persons. If so, then noting that parts need not be spatio-temporal, we might reconstruct (1) – (7) as follows:

(1'') The Father is a part of God

(2'') The Son is a part of God

(3'') The Holy Spirit is a part of God

(4'') The Father is not the same part of God as the Son

(5'') The Father is not the same part of God as the Holy Spirit

(6'') The Son is not the same part of God as the Holy Spirit

(7) There is exactly one God

(1'') – (7) are clearly consistent. Moreover if we remember that “God” is being treated as a mass term, designating all the divinity there is, in the way that “water” designates all the world’s water, of which lakes, rivers and puddles are parts, there is no difficulty in holding that the Persons are equally divine. Every body of water however small is thoroughly H2O: the humblest puddle is as watery as the Pacific Ocean and so, to that extent, water is wholly present in each of its parts. Similarly we can say that each Person is thoroughly God: divinity is wholly present in each of its (non-spatio-temporal) parts.

d. Relative Identity

Gregory’s proposal has not received widespread attention. However a comparable proposal, viz. that the “is” in (1) to (6) be construed as designating relative identity relations, has been widely discussed and solutions to the Trinity puzzle that make this move have been proposed by Peter Geach and more recently by Peter Van Inwagen.

According to Geach, identity statements of the form “x is identical with y” are incomplete: they are elliptical for “x is the same F as y” where F is a sortal term, that is a count noun that conveys criteria of identity. So common nouns like “table,” “man,” and “set” are sortals: grammatically they are count nouns and semantically they, in effect, provide instructions about how to identify them, how to chop out the hunk of the world they fill, how to distinguish them from other objects and how to trace their histories to determine when (if ever) they come into being and when (if ever) they cease to exist. Defenders of the relative identity thesis suggest that we cannot obey the instruction to “count all the things in this room” because “thing” does not convey identity criteria. If I am to count things, I need to know what sorts of things should I count? If I am asked whether this is the same as that, before I can answer I have to ask, “The same what?”

Geach notes further that, where F and G are sortals, it is possible to have cases where some x and y are the same F but not the same G. So, for example, we may want to say that 2/3 is the same rational number as 4/6 but not the same ordered pair of integers or that two copies of Ulysses are the same literary work but not the same book.

Finally, sortal-relative-identity relations are equivalence relations but they are not indiscernibility relations for all properties unrestrictedly. For any sortal-relative-identity relation, being-the-same-F-as, there is a set of predicates, SF, the indiscernibility set for F, such that for any predicate P Î SF, if x is the same F as y then x has P if and only if y has P. For predicates P* Ï SF the inferences from x is the same F as y and x has P* to y has P* and vice versa do not go through.

Now as regards the Trinity puzzle we note that “god” and “person” are sortals and hence that given Geach’s suggestion the following claims are consistent:

(1­R) The Father is the same god as God

(2R) The Son is the same god as God

(3R) The Holy Spirit is the same god as God

(4R) The Father is not the same divine person as the Son

(5R) The Father is not the same divine person as the Holy Spirit

(6R) The Son is not the same divine person as the Holy Spirit

The relative identity account of Trinitarian claims is similar to the reconstruction of Trinitarian claims in (1'') – (6'') insofar as rely on the strategy of invoking different relations in the first and last three statements: the relations of being-part-of-the-same-whole-as and being-the-same-part-as are different to one another as are the relations of being-the-same-god-as and being-the-same-divine-person-as. Consequently, (1R) – (6R) are consistent with (7). Sortals, as noted, provide rules for counting. Counting by book, two copies of Ulysses count as two; counting by literary work, they count as one. Similarly, the suggestion is that counting by divine person, the Father, Son and Holy Spirit count as three but counting by god they count as one and so we can affirm (7): there is exactly one God. The relative identity strategy thus avoids Tri-theism.

The relative identity strategy also circumvents the Jesus Predicate Problem, at least to the extent that we want to block inferences from “The Son Fs” to “The Father Fs” for a range of predicates including “became incarnate,” “was crucified,” “suffered under Pontius Pilate” and the like. To block objectionable inferences we note that these predicates do not fall within the indiscernibility set for divine person and so the relative identity strategy avoids Patripassionism.

In addition, on this account, we can explain why (1R) – (3R) entail that the Father, Son and Holy Spirit each have those properties that are constituitive of full divinity. We note that “is omnipotent,” “is omniscient,” “is omnibenevolent” and other generically divine properties are in the indiscernibillity set for god so that given God has the properties they designate we may infer that the same is true of the Father, Son and Holy Spirit. Intuitively, there are generically divine properties, designated by predicates in the indiscernibility set for for god, which all Trinitarian Persons have in virtue of (1R) – (3R) and there are hypostatic properties which each Person has in virtue of being the Person he is.

Relative identity is however a controversial doctrine in its own right and, even if we accept the metaphysical baggage it carries, may not suitable for theological purposes. So Michael Rae worries that relative identity commits one to a theologically disastrous antirealistism:

Many philosophers are attracted to antirealism, but accepting it as part of a solution to the problem of the Trinity is disastrous.  For clearly orthodoxy will not permit us to say that the very existence of Father, Son, and Holy Spirit is a theory-dependent matter.  Nor will it permit us to say that the distinctness of the divine Persons is somehow relative to our ways of thinking or theorizing. The latter appears to be a form of modalism. And yet it is hard to see how it could be otherwise if Geach’s theory of relative identity is true. For what else could it possibly mean to say that there is simply no fact about whether Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same thing as one another, the same thing as God, or, indeed, the same thing as Baal. (Michael Rae, “Relative Identity and the Doctrine of the Trinity,” Philosophia Christi vol. 5, No. 2)

e. The Trinity and Other Identity Puzzles

The logical problem of the Trinity arises because, as we have seen in 3.a, (1) – (7) are inconsistent if the “is” that figures in them is interpreted as the “is” of (absolute) identity. In this respect, the Trinity puzzle is comparable to a range of puzzles concerning the identity of ordinary material objects.

One range of such puzzles concerns the problem of material composition. A lump of clay is made into a statue. The statue and the lump occupy exactly the same spatial region so we want to say that they are they are the same thing and that there is just one material object in the region “they” occupy: we balk at the idea of more than one material object occupying exactly the same place. But the statue and the clay do not have all the same properties: the statue was formed by the sculptor but the lump was not; the lump can survive the most radical changes in shape, including changes that would transform it into a different statue but the statue cannot. Consequently we cannot hold that there is a statue and a lump of clay and that they are strictly identical without falling afoul of Leibniz’ Law. We want to say that the statue and clay count as one material object but we are barred from holding that they are strictly identical. In this respect the problem of material composition poses the same problem as the Trinity doctrine: we want to say the Persons are one God but we are barred, in this case by theological concerns, from saying that they are strictly identical.

The problem posed by the material composition and other identity puzzles, including the Ship of Theseus and the problem of the dividing self which figures in discussions of personal identity, is that there are a great many cases where we want to say that objects x and y are the same thing but where the relation between x and y is such that it violates the formal features of identity—either because it is one-many rather than one-one or because it is not an unrestricted indiscernibility relation. And this is precisely the problem posed by the doctrine of the Trinity.

It was noted above that the proposal in 3.b, that the “is” in (1) – (3) should be interpreted as the “is” of predication, is also unacceptable because it is tri-theistic. It was also noted that the accounts suggested in 3.c and 3.d are not overtly incoherent but ultimately depend respectively on whether a mereology and an account of relative are workable. The relative identity account has been discussed extensively in the literature. The worry about the relative identity account is not that it fails to produce the right results as regards the doctrine of the Trinity, but that relative identity is itself a questionable business and in any case carries metaphysical baggage that may be theologically unacceptable.

The moral of this story should perhaps be that “identity,” as Frege famously remarked, “gives rise to challenging questions which are not altogether easy to answer” (Gottlob Frege, “On Sense and Reference”). For all that critics have ridiculed the doctrine of the Trinity as a prime example of the absurdity of Christian doctrine—as the late Bishop Pike did when he suggested that the Trinity was “a sort of committee god”—Trinity talk is no worse off than much non-theological talk about the identities of non-divine persons and ordinary material objects.

4. References and Further Readings

  • Augustine. “On the Trinity.” The Early Church Fathers. Christian Classics Ethereal Library.
  • Baber, H. E. “Sabellianism Reconsidered.” in Sophia vol. 41, No. 2 (October 2002): 1-18.
  • Baber, H. E. “Trinity, Filioque and Semantic Ascent” forthcoming in Sophia.
  • Bobrinskoy, Boris. The Mystery of the Trinity. Crestwood, NY: St. Vladimir’s Seminary press, 1999.
  • Brower, Jeffrey E. and Michael C. Rea. “Material Constitution and the Trinity.” Faith and Philosophy 22 (2005): 57-76.
  • Brown, David. The Divine Trinity. London: Duckworth, 1985.
  • Cartwright, Richard. “On the Logical Problem of the Trinity.” In Philosophical Essays. The MIT Press, 1990.
  • Davis, Stephen T., Kendall, Daniel, S.J., and O’Collins, Gerald, S.J., eds. The Trinity. An Interdisciplinary Symposium on the Trinity. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Gregory of Nyssa. “To Ablabius.” The Early Church Fathers. Christian Classics Ethereal Library.
  • Hebblethwaite, Brian. Philosophical Theology and Christian Doctrine. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing Ltd, 2005. Esp. Ch. 5: “Trinity.”
  • Hippolytus, Against All Heresies, Book IX, The Early Church Fathers. Christian Classics Ethereal Library.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Anti Social Trinitarianism.” In The Trinity: An Interdisciplinary Symposium on the Trinity.  Feenstra, R. J. and Plantinga, C. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1989.
  • Peters, Ted. God as Trinity. Louisville, KY: Westminster/John Knox Press, 1993.
  • Photios, Patriarch of Constantinople. On the Mystagogy of the Holy Spirit. Astoria, NY: Studion Publishers, Inc., 1983.
  • Rea, Michael C. “Relative Identity and the Doctrine of the Trinity.” In Philosophic Christi vol. 5, No. 2 (2003): 431-445.
  • Rusch, William G., ed. The Trinitarian Controversy. Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1980.
  • Stead, C. Divine Substance. Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1977.
  • Studer, Basil. Trinity and Incarnation. Collegeville, MN: The Liturgical Press, 1993.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Christian God. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Van Inwagen, Peter. “And yet there are not three Gods but one God.” In Philosophy and the Christian Faith, ed. T. V. Morris. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988.
  • Yandell, K. E. “The most brutal and inexcusable error in counting?” Trinity and consistency.  Religious Studies 30 (1994): 201-17.

Author Information

H.E. Baber
University of San Diego
U. S. A.

Divine Immutability

Divine immutability, the claim that God is immutable, is a central part of traditional Christianity, though it has come under sustained attack in the last two hundred years.  This article first catalogues the historical precedent for and against this claim, then discusses different answers to the question, “What is it to be immutable?”   Two definitions of divine immutability receive careful attention.  The first is that for God to be immutable is for God to have a constant character and to be faithful in divine promises; this is a definition of “weak immutability.”  The second, “strong immutability,” is that for God to be immutable is for God to be wholly unchanging. After showing some implications of the definitions, the article focuses on strong immutability and provides some common arguments against the claim that God is immutable, understood in that way.  While most of the historical evidence discussed in this article is from Christian sources, the core discussion of what it is to be strongly immutable, and the arguments against it, are not particular to Christianity.

Table of Contents

  1. Some Historical Evidence for Divine Immutability
    1. Biblical Evidence for and against Divine Immutability
    2. Conciliar Evidence for Divine Immutability
    3. The Protestant Reformers and Divine Immutability
    4. Divine Immutability and Traditional Christianity
  2. What It Is To Be Immutable
    1. Immutability as Constancy of Character
    2. Strong Immutability—God Does Not Change in Any Way
  3. Objections to Strong Immutability
    1. God’s Knowledge of Temporally Indexed Truths, Omniscience and Immutability
    2. Immutability and Modal Collapse
    3. Responsiveness and an Immutable God
    4. Personhood and Immutability
    5. Immutability, Time, and Freedom
  4. Related Issues
    1. Divine Timelessness or Eternality
    2. Divine Impassibility
    3. The Incarnation
    4. Intrinsic/Extrinsic Properties
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Some Historical Evidence for Divine Immutability

Divine immutability is a central aspect of the traditional Christian doctrine of God, as this section will argue. For more detail on this point, see Dorner (1994) chapter 2 and Weinandy (1985).

a. Biblical Evidence for and against Divine Immutability

There are many biblical passages commonly cited as evidence either for or against the doctrine of divine immutability. This short section discusses just a few, with the aim of showing that the Bible is not explicitly clear one way or the other on the question of whether God is immutable. (See Gavrilyuk (2004), p 37-46, for a discussion of these passages and others.) Whichever view one takes on immutability, there are difficult passages for which one has to account.

In some places the Bible appears to speak in favor of divine mutability. For instance, consider these two passages:

Did Hezekiah king of Judah or anyone else in Judah put [Micah] to death? Did not Hezekiah fear the LORD and seek his favor? And did not the LORD relent, so that he did not bring the disaster he pronounced against them? (Jeremiah 26:1. This and all subsequent quotations from the Bible are taken from the New International Version).

In this first example we see the Lord relenting, not doing what he had said he would do.  That appears to be a case of changing from one course or plan of action to another.  Such change seems even clearer in the following case, where God, in response to a sin of David, both sends an angel to destroy Jerusalem, then, grieving the destruction, calls off the angel.

And God sent an angel to destroy Jerusalem. But as the angel was doing so, the LORD saw it and was grieved because of the calamity and said to the angel who was destroying the people, "Enough! Withdraw your hand" (1 Chronicles 21:15).

In this example, God puts a particular plan of action into effect, then, it appears, grieves his decision and reverses it.  God does it as a result of the calamity the angel was causing when destroying the people. God responds to his creation here, and relents.  Both of these texts, and others like them, seem to indicate that God changes, at least in changing his mind and commands. Other relevant biblical passages include, but are not limited to, Exodus 32:14 and Amos 7:1-3.

If all the evidence from the Bible were against immutability, one might think that the case against divine immutability, at least for the Christian and the Jew, would be closed.  However, the Bible also seems to teach that God does not change his mind.  For instance:

God is not a man, that he should lie, nor a son of man, that he should change his mind. Does he speak and then not act? Does he promise and not fulfill? (Numbers 23:19).

He who is the Glory of Israel does not lie or change his mind; for he is not a man, that he should change his mind (1 Samuel 15:29).

These two passages claim that God doesn’t change his mind and so are in tension with the previous two texts.  Beyond these two passages that claim that God does not change his mind, there are also passages where God is said not to change, for instance:

I the LORD do not change. So you, O descendants of Jacob, are not destroyed (Malachi 3:6).

Every good and perfect gift is from above, coming down from the Father of the heavenly lights, who does not change like shifting shadows (James 1:17).

Theologians and philosophers who wish to provide scriptural evidence for divine immutability have commonly cited these passages.

So the Biblical texts are either unclear as to whether God changes or not, or they are inconsistent.  If one wishes to maintain the consistency of scripture on the doctrine of God, one either needs to read the passages where God appears to change in light of the passages where it claims he does not, or vice versa.  But either way the Biblical evidence seems too weak to prove either divine immutability or its contrary.

b. Conciliar Evidence for Divine Immutability

While the biblical evidence seems to underdetermine whether divine immutability is true, the conciliar evidence favors the doctrine of divine immutability. While the later councils explicitly include immutability in their discussions of God’s nature, the earlier councils only discussed divine immutability in relation to the incarnation, the Christian teaching that the Second Person of the Trinity, the Son of God, became man.  This is because the incarnation seemed to require a change of some sort in God.  These early councils employed divine immutability to argue that there was no change in the Godhead when the Son became incarnate.

For instance, consider the conclusion to the creed of the first general council, Nicaea, in 325 (note that this is the end of the original creed, and not the more familiar Nicene-Constantinopolitan creed commonly employed in liturgies today):

And those who say “there once was when he was not”, and “before he was begotten he was not”, and that he came to be from things that were not, or from another hypostasis or substance, affirming that the Son of God is subject to change or alteration—these the catholic and apostolic church anathematizes (Tanner, 1990, p 5, emphasis  mine).

Here the council anathematizes those who claim that the Son of God is subject to change or alteration.  Some, particularly the Arians, were teaching that the Son was a creature and not the Creator.  This anathema is an attempt to rule out such a position by ruling out change in the Son, which only makes sense if God is changeless.  For, how would anathematizing the view that the Son changes rule out the Son’s being a creature unless being changing is incompatible with being God?  One should note, though, that even though the Arians taught that the Son was mutable, they didn’t deny the immutability of the Father, and in fact were attempting to safeguard the immutability of God in their teaching that the Son was a creature (see Gavrilyuk (2004) p 105-7, Weinandy (1985) p 5-20 for more on this).

Also, see the third letter of Cyril to Nestorius from the council of Ephesus, 431, which says, when speaking of Christ:

We do not say that his flesh was turned into the nature of the godhead or that the unspeakable Word of God was changed into the nature of the flesh. For he (the Word) is unalterable and absolutely unchangeable and remains always the same as the scriptures say (Tanner, 1990, p 51, the emphasis is mine.)

Here the council claims that the Word of God, the Second Person of the Trinity, is unalterable and absolutely unchangeable.  Notice, too, that the claim is made to defend against the unorthodox view that the twin natures of Christ mixed in the incarnation.  So whatever immutability comes to, it must come to something that rules out the admixture of natures.

Thirdly, see the Letter of Cyril to John of Antioch about Peace, again from the council of Ephesus:

...God the Word, who came down from above and from heaven, "emptied himself, taking the form of a slave", and was called son of man, though all the while he remained what he was, that is God (for he is unchangeable and immutable by nature)… (Tanner,1990, p 72, the emphasis is mine).

Here the council claims that God is unchangeable and immutable by nature.  Whereas the first two passages cited attribute immutability to the Son, this passage attributes it more generally to God.  But even still, it would be an odd Trinitarian theology that claimed the Son to be immutable but the other Persons to be mutable. Also of note is the letter of Pope Leo to Flavian, bishop of Constantinople, about Eutyches, read at the council of Chalcedon where Pope Leo writes of “the unalterable God, whose will is indistinguishable from his goodness” (Tanner, 1990, p 79).

The closer to the present one comes in western conciliar documents, the more explicitly and repeatedly one finds affirmation of divine immutability. For instance, see the fourth council of Constantinople (869-870), the eighth ecumenical council, by western reckoning, where the Fathers claim in their creedal statement:

We confess, indeed, God to be one…ever existing without beginning, and eternal, ever the same and like to himself, and suffering no change or alteration… (Tanner, 1990, p 161).

Notice that here the object said to be without change or alteration is explicitly God.  The first two conciliar statements cited claim that the Son is immutable, and the third quotation appears to claim that God, and not just the Son, is immutable, but here the object is clearly God.  Also, the creed from the Fourth Lateran council, which met in 1215, begins, “We firmly believe and simply confess that there is only one true God, eternal and immeasurable, almighty, unchangeable, incomprehensible and ineffable…” (Tanner, 1990, p 230); the council of Basel-Ferrara-Florence-Rome, which met from 1431-1445, “deliver[ing]…the following true and necessary doctrine...firmly professes and preaches one true God, almighty, immutable and eternal…” (Tanner, 1990, p 570); the First Vatican council, which met from 1869-1870, “believes and acknowledges that there is one true and living God…he is one, singular, completely simple and unchangeable spiritual substance…” (Tanner, 1990, p 805)  Such texts show that the early church councils of undivided Christendom, as well as the later western councils of the Catholic Church, clearly teach that God is immutable.

c. The Protestant Reformers and Divine Immutability

It isn’t just early Christianity in general and Catholicism in particular that dogmatically affirms divine immutability.  One can find divine immutability in the confessions and canons of traditional Protestantism.  For instance, see the confession of faith from the French (or Gallican) Confession of 1559:

We believe and confess that there is but one God, who is one sole and simple essence, spiritual, eternal, invisible, immutable, infinite, incomprehensible, ineffable, omnipotent; who is all-wise all-good, all-just, and all-merciful (Schaff, 1877, p 359-360).

Also, see the Belgic Confession of 1561, Article 1:

We all believe with the heart, and confess with the mouth, that there is one only simple and spiritual Being, which we call God; and that he is eternal, incomprehensible invisible, immutable, infinite, almighty, perfectly wise, just, good, and the overflowing fountain of all good. (Schaff, 1877, p 383-384)

For a confessional Lutheran affirmation of divine immutability, see, for instance, "The Strong Declaration of The Formula of Concord," XI.75, found in The Book of Concord:

And since our election to eternal life is founded not upon our godliness or virtue, but alone upon the merit of Christ and the gracious will of His Father, who cannot deny Himself, because He is unchangeable in will and essence…

In addition, see the first head, eleventh article of the canons of Dordt, from 1618-1619:

And as God himself is most wise, unchangeable, omniscient, and omnipotent, so the election made by him can neither be interrupted nor changed, recalled nor annulled; neither can the elect be cast away, nor their number diminished (Schaff, 1877, p 583).

And, finally, see the Westminster Confession of Faith from 1647:

There is but one only living and true God, who is infinite in being and perfection, 'a most pure spirit, invisible, without body, parts, or passions, immutable, immense, eternal, incomprehensible, almighty, most wise, most holy... (Schaff, 1877, p 606).

These texts show that the dogmatic and confessional affirmations of divine immutability carry on into Protestantism.

d. Divine Immutability and Traditional Christianity

If one understands traditional Christianity either as the faith of the early, undivided Church or as the intersection of the great, historical confessional statements of Christendom, then one has strong reason to believe that traditional Christianity includes the claim that God is immutable.  Just because one has reason to affirm that God is immutable, however, does not give one reason to favor a particular definition of immutability.  The following section discusses the two leading rival theories of what it is for God to be immutable.

2. What It Is To Be Immutable

Even if it is clear that traditional Christianity includes the doctrine of divine immutability, what, precisely, that doctrine amounts to is not perspicuous.  There are many subtle and nuanced views of immutability—far too many to receive individual attention in this article.  This article focuses on the two most commonly discussed views of immutability.  One is that divine immutability merely guarantees that God’s character is unchanging, and that God will remain faithful to his promises and covenants.  This first view does not preclude other sorts of change in God.  Another, stronger, view of immutability is that the doctrine of divine immutability rules out all intrinsic change in God.  This latter understanding of immutability is the historically common view.

a. Immutability as Constancy of Character

Some thinkers see immutability as the claim that God’s character is constant.  For instance, see Richard Swinburne’s The Coherence of Theism, where he discusses both types of immutability under consideration in this section. Here he sides with the constancy of character view, which he describes as "[i]n the weaker way to say of a person that he is immutable is simply to say that he cannot change in character." (Swinburne, 1993, p 219)  Isaak Dorner’s view is that God is ethically immutable but that divine vitality requires divine change. See Dorner (1994), especially the helpful introduction by Williams, p 19-23, and Dorner’s third essay, “The Reconstruction of the Immutability Doctrine.”  For discussions of Dorner, see Richards (2003) p 198-199 and Williams (1986). This view of immutability understands divine immutability to be the claim that God is constant in his character and virtue; that God is not fickle; and that God will remain true to his promises.

Notice that if immutability is understood in this sense, the Bible passages cited in section 1 may be easier to reconcile than on strong immutability.  The passages where God relents aren’t passages that prove that God is not constant in character.  It may well be God’s good character that causes him to relent.  Given the previous circumstances, God formed one set of intentions due to his constantly good character.  When the circumstances changed, God formed a different set of intentions, again due to his constantly good character.  What changes in these passages is not God’s good character. It is the circumstances God is in when he forms his intentions. Where the Bible teaches that God is unchanging, it means, in this understanding of immutability, that God’s character will not change.  It does not mean the stronger claim that God will not change at all.

One more point in favor of this understanding of immutability is that if it were true, other problems with divine immutability, problems discussed below in section 3, would no longer be problems.  For instance, there would be no problem of explaining how an unchanging God has knowledge of changing truths (e.g., like what time it is).  God’s knowledge could change, on this understanding of immutability, provided that such change in knowledge does not rule out constancy of character.

Another problem discussed in section 3 is that of the responsiveness of an immutable God.  Given weak immutability, divine immutability doesn’t necessitate divine unresponsiveness.  This is because God’s responding to prayers doesn’t require that his character change.  In fact, it could be exactly because his character does not change that he responds to prayers.  So responsiveness is not incompatible with this notion of immutability.  On the constancy of character understanding of immutability, not all change, and in particular, not change as a result of responding to prayer, is inconsistent with immutability.

Nevertheless, if this is the burden of divine immutability—that God’s character is constant—who would deny it (that is, what theist would deny it)?  Divine immutability is a modest thesis when understood as constancy of character.  But even if it is innocuous, and even if it has the above-mentioned positive features, it still has difficulties.  It still leaves a problem for biblical exegesis.  That’s because the first two passages discussed above in section 1 seem to show God changing his mind, whereas the second two seem to teach that God does not change his mind.  So while the fact that it provides some way to reconcile some of the biblical evidence is a point in favor of the constancy of character view, it still faces a difficulty in understanding the scriptures that seem to claim that God does not change his mind.

Moreover, divine immutability understood as only involving the constancy of character seems in tension with the use that the early teachings of the church at the first ecumenical councils made of the concept.  For instance, both quotations from the council of Ephesus claim that the Second Person of the Trinity did not change when assuming the human nature, and both point, as evidence, to the fact that he is unchangeable and immutable.  In fact, the second quotation from Ephesus has it that God is unchangeable and immutable by God’s very nature.  Immutability, however, would be no evidence for the claim that the Second Person of the Trinity didn’t change when assuming the human nature if all immutability amounts to is constancy of character.  How could the constancy of the Second Person’s character entail that he would not change when assuming the human nature?   What does that have to do with whether Christ’s “flesh was turned into the nature of the godhead or that the unspeakable Word of God was changed into the nature of the flesh”?  The change being ruled out at Ephesus is not moral change or change of character, but change of properties and change of nature.  So the early church councils don’t have the constancy of character view in mind when they claim that God is immutable.  If they had such a view in mind, they wouldn’t have thought to point to divine immutability in support of the claim that Christ didn’t change in becoming incarnate.

In regard to the later church councils and confessional statements, they don’t define the meaning of “immutability” when they assert it in the list of divine attributes.  Again, however, one notices that they do not put the affirmation of divine immutability in discussion of God’s character but in discussion of God’s existence.  One finds immutability in a list of other nonmoral attributes, and not subjugated to the affirmation that God is wholly good or holy.

For instance, the Fourth council of Constantinople teaches that God is immutable and unchangeable, and this not in relation to God’s character but in discussion of God’s very existence (“ever existing without beginning, and eternal, ever the same and like to himself, and suffering no change or alteration….”).  The claim of immutability isn’t made in relation to God’s moral character but in a list of affirmations concerning God’s mode of existence.

So, for the reasons given in the preceding paragraphs, divine immutability, taken in its traditional sense, should not be understood to mean merely constancy of character.  Surely constancy of character is a part of the concept.  But divine immutability must be more robust than that to do the work it has been tapped to do in traditional Christianity.

b. Strong Immutability—God Does Not Change in Any Way

A stronger understanding of divine immutability is that God is literally unable to change.  As Thomas Aquinas, a commonly cited proponent of this view, says: God is “altogether immutable…it is impossible for God to be in any way changeable” (Summa Theologiae, the First Part, Question nine, Article one, the response; the quotation is from the translation at God doesn’t change by coming to be or ceasing to be; by gaining or losing qualities; by any quantitative growth or diminishment; by learning or forgetting anything; by starting or stopping willing what he wills; or in any other way that requires going from being one way to being another.

Whenever a proposition about God changes truth-value, the reason for the change in truth-value of the proposition is not, on this view of immutability, because of a change in God, but because of some other change in something else. (I speak here of a proposition changing its truth-value, though it is not essential for divine immutability that propositions can change truth-values.  If the reader holds a view where propositions have their truth-values eternally, the reader may substitute in his or her preferred paraphrase for apparent change in the truth-value of propositions.)  Father Jones is praising God, and so the proposition that God is being praised by Father Jones is true.  Later that same proposition is no longer true, but not because of any change in God.  It is no longer true because Father Jones stopped praising God, and not because God is in any way different than he was.  Likewise in other situations: God doesn’t go from being one way to being another; rather, something else changes and on account of that a proposition about God changes its truth-value.

One may wonder about the viability of this account when it deals with events that clearly seem to involve God doing something.  For instance, God talked to Abraham at a certain time in history.  Consider the proposition: God is talking to Abraham.  That was true at one point (Hagar might have whispered it to Ishmael after the youth asked what his father was doing).  At other times, God is not talking to Abraham.  But isn’t the change here a change in what God is doing?  Doesn’t God go from talking to not talking to Abraham?  And if so, how does that fit with the claim made in the previous paragraph, that changes in propositions about God are due to changes in things besides God?

The defender of strong immutability will draw a distinction here between the actions of God and their effects.  God, on this view, is unchangingly performing his divine action or actions, but the effects come and go.  Compare: In one swift action I throw a barrel full of messages in bottles overboard in the middle of the Atlantic.  This action of mine has multiple effects: it causes waves and ripples as the bottles hit the water.  Later, it causes other effects as people read the messages I’ve sent.  I convey some information to those whom the bottles reach, but the action I performed to do so has long since ceased.  Depending on one’s view of divine simplicity and divine eternity, some aspects of this analogy will have to be changed.  But the point remains: one action can have multiple effects at multiple times.  God immutably acts to talk with Abraham, and either does so atemporally or, if God is inside of time, has always and will always so act.  The changing of the truth-value of the proposition that God is talking to Abraham is not due to God changing, on this theory, but due to the effects of God’s action coming and going.

Strong immutability has a few things going for it.  First, it is congruent with the final four passages of Scripture cited in section 1.  If God is strongly immutable, he cannot change his mind, and he also cannot change.  So these last four passages pose no problem on this understanding of immutability.

Also, this stronger notion of immutability does the work needed for the early councils, which point to immutability to show that the Second Person of the Trinity does not change when assuming the human nature.  The conciliar reference to divine immutability is understandable if immutability is understood as strong immutability, whereas it is not understandable if it is understood in the weaker constancy of character sense.

Finally, this strong understanding of divine immutability is very common in church history. Just like the constancy of character model of divine immutability, however, this understanding is not without its own problems.  First it has to provide a way of understanding the first two scripture citations, as well as the many others where God appears to change. Furthermore, it has other difficulties, which are consider in the following section.

3. Objections to Strong Immutability

There are many objections to the strong view of divine immutability, some of which were discussed in the previous section, including changes which appear to be changes in God, but which, on this view, are parsed as changes in other things, such as the effects of the unchanging divine action.  This section discusses some other objections to strong immutability.

a. God’s Knowledge of Temporally Indexed Truths, Omniscience and Immutability

Here is a truth that I know:  that it is now 2:23pm.  That is something I couldn’t know a minute ago, and it is something that I won’t know in a minute.  At that time, I’ll know a different truth: that it is now 2:24pm.  Either God knows such temporally indexed truths—truths that include reference to particular times at which they are true—or not.  If God does not know such truths, then he is not omniscient, since there is something to be known—something a lowly creature like me does, in fact, know—of which God is ignorant.  Since very few theists, especially of a traditional stripe, are willing to give up divine omniscience, very few will be willing to claim that God is ignorant of temporally changing truths like truths about what time it is.

If God is omniscient, then God knows such temporally changing truths.  If God does know such temporally changing truths, then God changes, since God goes from knowing that it is now 2:23pm to knowing that it is now 2:24pm.  And worse, God changes with much more frequency, since there are more fine-grained truths to know about time than which minute it is (for instance, what second it is, what millisecond it is, etc.)  If God knows such truths at some times but not at others, God changes.  And if God changes, divine immutability is false.  So if God is omniscient, he is not immutable.  Therefore, God is either not immutable or not omniscient.  And since both views are explicitly held by traditional Christianity (and other monotheisms) there is a problem here for the traditional proponent of divine immutability.  This argument was put forward forcefully by Norman Kretzmann in his article Omniscience and Immutability (1966).

There are a few common responses to this argument.  First, one can claim that in order to be omniscient, God needn’t know indexed truths as indexed truths.  Second, one might claim that knowledge is not an intrinsic state or property, and that God’s immutability extends only to God’s intrinsic properties.  Third, one might argue that God does not know in the same way that we know, and this problem arises only if God knows things by being acquainted with particular propositions, as we know things.  Fourth, one might respond by assuming God is atemporally eternal and distinguishing the present-tensed terms in the premises between the eternal and temporal present.

Consider the first response.  God needn’t know that now it is 2:23pm.  Rather he knows the same fact under a non-temporally-indexed description.  For instance, God knows that the expression of this proposition, that it is now 2:23pm, is simultaneous with a state that, by convention, we call 2:23pm.  Such knowledge of simultaneity doesn’t require a temporal indexing, and so doesn’t require change across time.  One may wonder here, though, whether indexicals can be eliminated from all indexed propositions without any change in the meaning of the propositions. (For more on whether knowledge of indexical propositions can be reduced to knowledge of nonindexed propositions, see John Perry (1979).)

The second response is put forward by Brian Leftow.  Leftow understands divine immutability as the doctrine that God undergoes no change of intrinsic properties.  Intrinsic properties are properties that involve only the bearer of that property, or, put another way, properties that a thing would have even if it were the only thing in existence, or, put another way, properties a thing would have that don’t require other things to have particular properties (Leftow, 2004). My shape is a property intrinsic to me, as is my being rational.  If you could quarantine me from the influence of everything else, I’d still have my bodily shape and my rationality.  My distance from the Eiffel Tower or height relative to my little cousin, however, are extrinsic properties, since they require the existence of certain things and their having particular properties.  By changing something else and leaving me the same—let my cousin grow for a few more years—you can change my extrinsic properties.  But not so with my intrinsic properties. (This is a rough understanding of intrinsic properties, since if you quarantined me off from the influence of everything I wouldn’t have air to breathe, wouldn’t be under the influence of gravity, light, or anything else.  What it is to be intrinsic is notoriously difficult to define.  For more on intrinsic properties, see David Denby (2006).)

Is God’s knowledge intrinsic or extrinsic to God?  On this definition of intrinsic, God’s knowledge of creatures is extrinsic.  For instance, God’s being such that he knows that it is now 2:24pm entails that something else (for instance, the universe, or the present) has a property (for instance, to give some examples from Leftow (2008), being a certain age, or being a certain temporal distance from the first instant). Likewise for God’s knowledge of other changing facts; since God’s knowing that a is F, where a is not God, entails something about another being having a property—namely, it entails that a is F—such properties of God are extrinsic.  Hence God’s going from knowing that a is F to knowing that a is not F does not require an intrinsic change, and thus is not contrary to divine immutability.

This response faces a difficulty because even if God’s knowledge of other things is extrinsic, since it entails properties in things other than God, belief is not extrinsic.  My knowledge of who is in the adjoining office changes when people come and go, since knowledge entails truth, and the truth of who is there changes.  But my belief of who is there, having no necessary relation to truth, can remain constant even across change in truth-values.  This shows that even if knowledge is intrinsic, since it fluctuates with truth, belief is not extrinsic, since beliefs can be as they are whether or not the world is as they present it.

So even if God’s knowledge of creatures is extrinsic, God’s beliefs concerning creatures are intrinsic, since they don’t require anything of creatures.  This suggests that the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction will not save strong immutability from an argument from changing truths based on beliefs rather than knowledge.  In response to an argument run from beliefs rather than knowledge, one might point out that God believes all and only what is true.  Thus God's beliefs about creatures, and not merely his knowledge about them, will be extrinsic. This is because God believes something if and only if he knows it, and he knows it if and only if it is true: God's belief that a is F entails, and is entailed by, that a is F.

A second difficulty with Leftow’s response is that knowing and believing seem to be quintessential intrinsic properties, which might lead one to reject this understanding of intrinsic properties.  A third problem is that this view, far from keeping God unchanging, instead has some of his properties changing every instant, since he extrinsically changes with every passing instant.  If change of a property entails change full stop, and it seems to, then God is continually changing on this view.  A fourth and final problem is that this answer is inconsistent with another traditional attribute of God—atemporality.  An atemporal God cannot change at all, since change requires time.  So even if this response can answer the other problems, the proponent of divine eternality, and this includes Leftow, will not be able to embrace this response.

Tom Sullivan champions the third response. He argues that the problem arises due to a misunderstanding of how God knows.  We know by being properly related to certain thoughts or propositions.  So when the time changes, the proposition or thought we need to be related to in order to know the truth changes.  But if God does not know by being related to propositions, but in some other sui generis way that doesn’t require change in relation to propositions, then the problem may be defused (Sullivan, 1991).

This is a negative response, since it only says we don’t know as God knows, and doesn’t spell out the mode of knowing that God has.  And this counts against the response, since it doesn’t give us a way of understanding how God knows.  By being undeveloped, it is hard to analyze its merits.  Nevertheless, if it is true that God knows in a way unique to him, then that way may help solve the problem.

A final response is due to Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann. Their response assumes divine eternity, which implies, in part, that God is atemporal.  They argue that the claim that God knows what time it is now is ambiguous between four readings, depending on whether the “knows” is understood as an eternally present or temporally present verb, and depending on whether the now refers to the temporal now or the atemporal now.  Thus, God knows (eternally or temporally) what time it is now (that is, in the temporal present or the eternal present).  Nothing can know what time it is in the eternal present, since in the eternal present there is no time.  So we must understand the sense of ‘now’ to be ranging over the temporal present and not the eternal present.  God, since eternal, cannot know at the present time, but must know eternally.  So the only viable reading of the four possible readings is God knows eternally what is happening in the temporal present.  Consider the following inference introduced earlier: “If God does know such temporally changing truths, then God changes, since God goes from knowing that it is now 2:23pm to knowing that it is now 2:24pm.”  This inference, Stump and Kretzmann claim, does not hold when it is disambiguated as they disambiguate it.  For God eternally knows that at different times different truths are true, for instance, that it is now (at the temporal present) a certain time, but he knows these truths in one unchanging, atemporal action.  God’s eternal knowledge not only doesn’t allow for change; it positively rules change out, since change is inconsistent with eternity.  God eternally knows what is happening now, and at every other time, but in so knowing doesn’t go from being one way to being another.  Rather God simultaneously knows (on the assumption of divine eternity) in one act of knowing all temporally indexed truths (Stump and Kretzmann, 1981, p 455-458).

This response requires the assumption of divine eternity, which may be a cost for some defenders of divine immutability.  Also, it requires an understanding of simultaneity that can allow for God to be simultaneous with all times, but not entail that all times be simultaneous. Stump and Kretzmann offer such an account of simultaneity. (For more on this topic, see Leftow (1991) chapters 14 and 15.)

b. Immutability and Modal Collapse

One might worry that strong immutability leads to a modal collapse—that whatever is actually the case is necessary and whatever is not the case is impossible.  For, one might think, if it is impossible that God change, then no matter what happens, God will be the same.  So, no matter what happens, God will talk to Abraham at a certain time.  God can’t change to do anything else.  And if God can’t change to do anything else, then it seems like he’s stuck doing what he does, knowing what he knows, desiring what he desires, and so on, come what may.  And if that’s true, it is a small step to saying nothing could be different than it is, since if God hadn’t talked to Abraham at a certain time, God would be different.  And if God were different, he would be mutable.

The key to responding to this objection is to draw a distinction between being different in different circumstances and changing.  Divine immutability rules out that God go from being one way to being another way.  But it does not rule out God knowing, desiring, or acting differently than he does.  It is possible that God not create anything.  If God hadn’t created anything, he wouldn’t talk to Abraham at a certain time (since no Abraham would exist).  But such a scenario doesn’t require that God change, since it doesn’t require that there be a time when God is one way, and a later time when he is different.  Rather, it just requires the counterfactual difference that if God had not created, he would not talk to Abraham.  Such a truth is neutral to whether or not God changes.  In short, difference across possible worlds does not entail difference across times.  Since all that strong immutability rules out is difference across times, divine immutability is not inconsistent with counterfactual difference, and hence does not entail a modal collapse.  Things could have been otherwise than they are, and, had they been different, God would immutably know things other than he does, all without change (to see more on this, see Stump (2003) p 109-115.) In the words of one Catholic dogmatist:

Because of His unchangeableness God cannot revoke what he has once freely decreed,—such decisions, for instance, as to create a visible world, to redeem the human race, to permit Christ to die on the cross, etc.—though it is possible, of course, that some other Economy different from the present might be governed by entirely different divine decrees (Pohle, 1946, p 283).

One might still have worries about modal collapse here, especially if one affirms the doctrine of divine simplicity along with strong immutability, as most proponents of strong immutability do.

As I’ve argued, strong immutability rules out differences across times, but not across possible situations or worlds (or Economies, as Pohle has it).  The doctrine of divine simplicity—the thesis that in God there is no composition whatsoever, that God is uniquely metaphysically simple—seems to rule out difference across possible worlds. For what is there in God to be different if God is wholly simple?  So it seems that these two doctrines together rule out God’s being different at all, either across time or across worlds, and so, together, they seem to entail a modal collapse.

The first thing to note here is that, even if it is true that the doctrines of divine simplicity and strong immutability together entail a modal collapse—and there is good reason to be suspicious of this claim—the doctrine of divine simplicity is doing all the work in entailing the modal collapse.  This is because it, and it alone, seems to entail that God is the same in all possible worlds—strong immutability is silent on this point.  The second thing to note here is that the doctrine of divine simplicity can be understood in many different ways, some of which do not require simplicity to entail modal collapse.  Enumerating and defending these ways, however, is beyond the scope of this entry. (For two such understandings of divine simplicity, see Stump (2003), p 109-115, and Brower (2008)).

c. Responsiveness and an Immutable God

Adherents to the three great monotheisms, as well as other theists, traditionally believe that God answers prayers.  Answering prayers requires a response to the actions of another (in particular, a response to a petition).  Here is an argument that begins with responsiveness and concludes to a mutable God.  God is responsive to prayers.  Anything that is responsive, in responding, undergoes change.  Thus if God responds to prayers, then God undergoes change.  If God undergoes change, then God is not immutable.  Therefore, if God responds to prayers, then God is not immutable.

One response to this argument is to define immutability in the weaker sense of constancy of character (the discussion here follows Eleonore Stump’s treatment of divine responsiveness in her book Aquinas (Stump, 2003, p 115-118).  See also Stump and Kretzmann, “Eternity,” especially pages 450-451).  Immutability, so defined, does not rule out responsiveness to prayers.  In fact, it might be God’s character that accounts for divine responsiveness.  The defender of the strong immutability, however, will have to make a different reply.  Since she will affirm that God responds to prayers, she will reject the claim that responsiveness requires change.  One way to support such a rejection is to provide an analysis of responsiveness that doesn’t require change across time.  Here are two such analyses:

J is responsive to T’s request to x if and only if J does x because T requested it.

J is responsive to T’s request to x if and only if J does x, and J might not have done x if T didn’t request it.

If either of these two closely related views is correct, then responsiveness doesn’t require temporal priority or change.  Notice that nothing in these two understandings of responsiveness requires change in the part of a responder.  In many cases where someone changes in responding it is, in part, due to her gaining new knowledge or having to prepare to respond.  But suppose that there was no point in her existence where she didn’t know that to which she responds or isn’t prepared to respond.  It might be hard to imagine what that would be like for a human, since we humans were once ignorant, powerless babes.  But suppose a person were omniscient and omnipotent for all of his existence.  God, since omniscient, knows of all petitions, and, since omnipotent, needn’t ever prepare to answer a petition.  So God doesn’t fall under the conditions that humans fall under which require change on their parts to respond.  God can be immutably responding to the petitions of his followers.  That is, God can act in certain ways because his followers ask him to, and he might not have acted that way had they not asked.  But he doesn’t need to change in order to do so.

What responsiveness does require is counterfactual difference.  That is, had the circumstances been different than they are, then God might have done differently.  And that’s true.  Had Monica not asked for Augustine’s conversion, and God saved Augustine, at least in part, because Monica asked him to, God might not have converted Augustine.  All this leads to an important point: responsiveness is a modal, not temporal, concept.  That is, responsiveness has to do with difference across possible situations and not change across times. To respond is to do something because of something else.  Since we’ve seen in the previous objection that divine immutability does not rule out counterfactual difference, responsiveness is not ruled out by immutability.  While in very many cases it seems that responsiveness will require change, it does not require change in situations where the responder need not gain knowledge and need not prepare to respond.

d. Personhood and Immutability

Some thinkers have claimed that there is an inconsistency in something’s being both a person and unchanging.  One reason for thinking that personhood and immutability are inconsistent is that being a person requires being able to respond, and responsiveness is not possible for something immutable.  That objection was already discussed in the proceeding section.  But there are other reasons for thinking that personhood and immutability are inconsistent.

Richard Swinburne claims that personhood and immutability are inconsistent because immutability is inconsistent with responsiveness, as the previous objection had it, and additionally because immutability is inconsistent with freedom.  God is free, and, according to Swinburne:

[A]n agent is perfectly free at a certain time if his action results from his own choice at that time and if his choice is not itself brought about by anything else.  Yet a person immutable in the strong sense would be unable to perform any action at a certain time other than what he had previously intended to do.  His course of action being fixed by his past choices, he would not be perfectly free (Swinburne, 1993, p 222).

A strongly immutable God cannot be free, and God is perfectly free, so God is not strongly immutable.

One response to this problem is to invoke divine timelessness.  If God is outside of time, this passage, which is about things that are “free at a certain time” does not apply to God. Furthermore, if we were to drop the “at a certain time” from the text, the proponent of divine timelessness would still have a response to this argument.  Given that God is atemporal, it isn’t true of God that he “previously intended to do” anything.  There are no previous or later intentions for an atemporal being—they are all at once.  Likewise, he would have no “past choices” to fix his actions.  So this argument is not applicable to an atemporal, immutable person.

Even for a temporally located immutable person, there are still responses to this argument.  The perfectly free, temporally located, immutable person needn’t have his actions brought about by anything else besides his own choices.  Such an agent can still fulfill the criterion set out by Swinburne for being perfectly free.  God’s immutable action is brought about by his own choice at a time, and his choice is not brought about by any previous things, including previous choices.  Swinburne is right that God’s past choices would bring about his present actions (being immutable, God’s choices can’t change, so the past choices are identical with the present choices), but he is wrong in thinking that his choice is brought about by previous things.  For the choice of a temporal, immutable God is everlastingly the exact same (if God goes from choosing one thing to not choosing that thing, he is not immutable).  God’s action is everlastingly the same, and everlastingly brought about by God’s choice, which is also everlastingly the same.  God’s course of action is, as Swinburne says, fixed by past choices, but those past choices are identical with the current choices, and the choices are not brought about by anything else.  So such a being will fulfill the definition of what it is to be perfectly free.

One might also think that personhood requires rationality, consciousness, the ability to communicate, and being self-conscious (William Mann, 1983, p 269-272). Notice that none of these properties are inconsistent with immutability.  Some aspects of human rationality and consciousness aren’t available for an immutable person, for example, getting angry, learning something new, or becoming aware of a situation.  That doesn’t entail that an immutable person cannot be rational or conscious at all.  Rather, it means that the aspects of rationality or consciousness that require temporal change are ruled out.  But an immutable God can still be aware of what Moses does, still respond in a way we can call wrathful, and still love Moses.  Such actions are clear cases of rationality and consciousness and none of them require, as a necessary condition, change in the agent.

e. Immutability, Time, and Freedom

Suppose that God is in time, but immutable.  That means his knowledge can’t change over time, as discussed in a previous objection.  So anything God knows now, he knew a thousand years ago.  And here’s one thing that God knows now: what I freely chose to eat for breakfast yesterday.  I know such a truth, so God can’t be ignorant of it.  Given immutability, God can’t go from not knowing it to knowing it.  So he has everlastingly known it.  Similarly for all other truths.  In general, God knows what we are going to do before we do it.

If God knows before I act that I am going to act in that way, then I can’t do anything but act in that way.  And if, for every one of my actions, I can’t do otherwise, then I can’t be free.  Put another way, God’s knowledge ten thousand years ago that I would do thus-and-such entails that now I do thus-and-such.  And that’s true of all my actions.  So God’s knowledge determines all of my actions.

The proponent of an eternal, immutable God doesn’t face this problem, since on that view God doesn’t, strictly speaking, know anything before anything else.  Likewise, someone who denies immutability may get around this objection by affirming that God changes to learn new facts as time marches on.  But the defender of a temporal, immutable God has neither of these options available.

One response open to the defender of a temporal, immutable God is to embrace the view, presented above in section 3.a, that immutability doesn’t rule out extrinsic change, and gaining or losing knowledge is extrinsic change.  The benefits and costs of this view were discussed above.

Another response would be to argue that there is an asymmetry between truths and the world which allows for prior logical determination not to render a posterior action unfree. Truths are true because reality is as it is, and not the other way around.  So the truth of God’s knowledge that I do thus-and-such is because I do thus-and-such, and not the converse.  In order to get unfree action, one must have one’s actions be done because of something else, such as force.  Since the dependence of truth on reality requires the “because of” relations to run the other way, actions entailed by the truth of earlier truths do not render such actions unfree. ( Trenton Merricks, 2009; see also Kevin Timpe, 2007).

A final response is to claim that God knows all the actions that I will do, and he knew them far before I do actually perform those actions, but, were I to freely do something else, he would have known differently than he does.  This answer requires backwards counterfactual dependence of God’s knowledge on future actions.  But it doesn’t, at least without much argument, require backwards causation. This view is known as Ockham’s Way Out, and was popularized in an article by Alvin Plantinga (1986) entitled, aptly, “On Ockham’s Way Out.”

4. Related Issues

There are both philosophical and theological issues related to divine immutability.  Some theological issues include the relationship between immutability and other attributes and the consistency of God becoming man yet being strongly immutable.  As for philosophically related issues, one is the issue discussed above in section 3.e: the issue of (theological) determinism and free will.  Another relevant issue is the distinction, so important to Leftow’s understanding of immutability (see section 3.a), between intrinsic and extrinsic properties.

a. Divine Timelessness or Eternality

As is clear from the responses to some objections in section 3, supposing that God is outside of time has some advantages when it comes to answering objections to divine immutability (Mann, 1983). Divine timelessness entails divine immutability, given that change has as a necessary condition time in which to change.  But running the entailment relation the other way—from immutability to timelessness—is more difficult.  If one can show that existing in time requires at least one sort of intrinsic change—if, for instance, change in age or duration of existence is intrinsic change—then one can argue that immutability and temporality are inconsistent (Leftow, 2004). For arguments from immutability to timelessness, see Leftow (2004).

b. Divine Impassibility

Divine impassibility is the claim that God cannot have affects, or be affected by things.  Paul Gavrilyuk describes it as follows:

[T]hat [God] does not have the same emotions as the gods of the heathen; that his care for human beings is free from self-interest and any association with evil; that since he has neither body nor soul, he cannot directly have the experiences typically connected with them; that he is not overwhelmed by emotions and in the incarnation emerges victorious over suffering and death (Gavrilyuk (2004) 15-16; for other definitions of the term, see Creel (1986) 3-10).

Notice that impassibility, as so described, doesn’t entail immutability.  An agent can be impassible in the sense described by Gavrilyuk but still mutable.  He can, for instance, change in going from not promising to promising and be impassible.  Likewise, an immutable God can be passible.  He can be continually undergoing an emotion without change—for instance, he could be continually feeling the sorrow over human sin without change (Leftow, 2004). Neither entails the other. Nevertheless, they are closely related and often discussed in tandem.

c. The Incarnation

The incarnation is the doctrine, central to Christianity, that the Son of God, the Second Person of the Trinity, assumed a full human nature (that is, all that there is to a human), and became man.  Thus the one divine person had two natures—one divine, and one human, each with its own intellect and will, and these two natures didn’t mix together or exclude one another.  For the most important traditional expression of this doctrine, see the council of Chalcedon.  (Though it must be said that the doctrine wasn’t fully developed—in particular, the parts about Christ having two wills—until later councils.)

The incarnation raises questions concerning the immutability of God insofar as in the incarnation the Second Person of the Trinity becomes a man, and becoming, at least on the face of it, appears to involve change.  So the incarnation, it has been argued, is inconsistent with divine immutability.

This is not the place to go into a theological discussion of the consistency of the two teachings.  One should note, however, that the very church fathers and councils that teach that Christ’s two natures didn’t change one another or mix together, provide as evidence, as we saw in sections 1.b and 2, that God is absolutely unchangeable by his very nature.  So the principle of charity dictates that if we do find ourselves understanding immutability and the incarnation such that there is an explicit, obvious contradiction between them, noticeable by the merest reflection upon the two doctrines, the chances are that it is our understanding, and not the traditional doctrine's, that is at fault. To see more on the relationship between the incarnation and immutability, see Richards (2003) p 209-210 and Dodds (1986) p 272-277.  Stump (2003) chapter 14 is helpful here as well.  Also, see Weinandy (1985), which is a book-length discussion of this very question.

d. Intrinsic/Extrinsic Properties

The distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties is important to the discussion of divine immutability because there needs to be a way to distinguish between the predications concerning God which can change in truth-value without precluding divine immutability and those that can’t.  This was discussed in sections 2.b and 3.a.  Divine immutability is compromised if that God is planning to redeem creation changes in truth-value, but it is not compromised if that God is being praised by Father Jones changes in truth-value.  The difference between propositions of these two sorts is often spelled out in terms of intrinsic and extrinsic properties (oftentimes extrinsic changes are called Cambridge changes).  God’s plans are intrinsic to God, but his being praised is extrinsic to him (unless he is praising himself).

5. References and Further Reading

  • Brower, Jeffrey. “Making Sense of Divine Simplicity”. Faith and Philosophy 25(1) 2008. p 3-30.
  • Creel, Richard. Divine Impassibility. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • Denby, David. “The Distinction between Intrinsic and Extrinsic Properties”. Mind: A Quarterly Review of Philosophy 115(457) 2006. p 1-17.
  • Dodds, Michael. The Unchanging God of Love: a Study of the Teaching of St. Thomas Aquinas on Divine Immutability in View of Certain Contemporary Criticism of This Doctrine. Fribourg: Editions Universitaires, 1986.
    • This book provides a detailed and historical look at Thomas Aquinas’ understanding of immutability, as well as defending it against objections.
  • Dorner, I. and Robert Williams. Divine Immutability. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1994.
    • This is an important work on immutability by a 19th century theologian, which receives more attention in theological than in philosophical contexts.
  • Gavrilyuk, Paul. The Suffering of the Impassible God. Oxford Oxfordshire: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • This is a good, recent discussion of divine impassibility.
  • Kretzmann, Norman. “Omniscience and Immutability”. Journal of Philosophy 63(14) 1966. p 409-421.
  • Leftow, Brian.  “Eternity and Immutability.” The Blackwell Guide to Philosophy of Religion.  Mann, William E.  Blackwell Publishing, 2004.
    • This is an excellent article on divine immutability and eternality from a philosophical viewpoint.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Immutability”. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
    • This, too, is an excellent article on divine immutability from a philosophical viewpoint.
  • Leftow, Brian. Time and Eternity. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991.
    • This book provides a technical, extended discussion of divine eternality, its entailments, and arguments for and against it.
  • Mann, William. “Simplicity and Immutability in God”. International Philosophical Quarterly 23, 1983. p 267-276.
    • This article argues that divine immutability is best understood in the light of divine eternality and simplicity.  It also includes a nice discussion of immutability and personhood.
  • Merricks, Trenton.  “Truth and Freedom”. Philosophical Review 118(1), 2009. p 29-57.
  • Perry, John. “The Problem of the Essential Indexical”. Noûs 13, 1979. p 3-21.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. “On Ockham's Way Out”. Faith and Philosophy 3(3) 1986. p 235-269.
  • Pohle, Joseph and Arthur Preuss.  God: His Knowability, Essence, and Attributes.  St. Louis, MO: Herder Book Co, 1946.
    • This is volume from a standard dogmatic set, which contains biblical, patristic, and philosophical arguments for Catholic dogmas.
  • Richards, Jay. The Untamed God. Downers Grove: InterVarsity Press, 2003.
    • This book is about divine immutability and simplicity.  It is written at a good level for a beginner, but contains discussion useful for advanced readers as well.
  • Schaff, Philip.  The Creeds of Christendom: The Evangelical Protestant Creeds, with Translations. Harper, 1877.
    • This is a useful collection of confessional statements from the protestant reformers and their successors.
  • Stump, Eleonore. Aquinas. New York: Routledge, 2003.
    • An excellent discussion of Aquinas’s philosophy, which includes extended discussions of divine responsiveness, immutability, simplicity, and eternality.
  • Stump, Eleonore, and Norman Kretzmann, "Eternity". Journal of Philosophy 78, 1981. p 429-458.
    • A seminal article on the relationship between time and God.
  • Sullivan, Thomas D.  "Omniscience, Immutability, and the Divine Mode of Knowing". Faith and Philosophy 8(1) 1991. p 21-35.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1993.
  • Tanner, Norman. Decrees of the Ecumenical Councils. Franklin: Sheed & Ward, 1990.
    • An excellent two volume work which contains the decrees of the councils in the original languages, with facing translations.
  • Timpe, Kevin. “Truthmaking and Divine Eternity”. Religious Studies 43(3) 2007. p 299-315.
  • Weinandy, Thomas. Does God Change?. Still River: St. Bede's Publications, 1985.
    • This book is an interesting historical discussion of what it means to say that God is immutable but became man.
  • Williams, Robert R., “I. A Dorner: The Ethical Immutability of God”. Journal of the American Academy of Religion 54(4), 1986. p 721-738.

Author Information

Tim Pawl
University of Saint Thomas
U. S. A.

Divine Simplicity

Divine simplicity is central to the classical Western concept of God. Simplicity denies any physical or metaphysical composition in the divine being. This means God is the divine nature itself and has no accidents (properties that are not necessary) accruing to his nature. There are no real divisions or distinctions in this nature. Thus, the entirety of God is whatever is attributed to him.  Divine simplicity is the hallmark of God’s utter transcendence of all else, ensuring the divine nature to be beyond the reach of ordinary categories and distinctions, or at least their ordinary application. Simplicity in this way confers a unique ontological status that many philosophers find highly peculiar.

Inspired by Greek philosophy, the doctrine exercised a formative influence on the development of Western philosophy and theology. Its presence reverberates throughout an entire body of thought. Medieval debates over simplicity invoked fundamental problems in metaphysics, semantics, logic, and psychology, as well as theology. For this reason, medieval philosopher-theologians always situate the doctrine within a larger framework of concepts and distinctions crafted to deal with its consequences. An inadequate grasp of this larger framework continues to hamper the modern debates. Detractors and proponents frequently talk past each other, as this article will show. Reconstructing this larger context is not feasible here. But it will be necessary to refer to its main outlines if one is to capture the basic sense of the doctrine in its original setting.

The following overview begins with a look at some high watermarks of the doctrine. Next it  looks at what has motivated the doctrine throughout its long career. A look at the origins and motives is followed by some representative objections. The bulk of the rest of the article  sketches some common responses to these objections. The responses invoke aspects of the doctrine’s original context to further understanding of it. This treatment will mainly discuss objections to the doctrine’s internal coherence. Problems involving the compatibility of simplicity with another particular teaching generally require highly individual treatment beyond the present scope; this is also so with revealed matters such as the Trinity or Incarnation. However, some general considerations will prove applicable to these individual issues. Progress on the systematic issues seems tied to  understanding the intrinsic claims of the doctrine. A separate article examines God’s immutability, though again some considerations here could prove applicable. The following discussion will suggest that disagreements over simplicity tend to reflect prior theological disagreements over  the fundamental character of God and  what language about God can or cannot imply.

Table of Contents

  1. Origins
  2. Doctrine and Implications
  3. Motives
  4. Difficulties
  5. Responses
    1. Ontology
    2. Persons
    3. Negations
    4. Multiple Predicates
    5. Existence
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Origins

Classic statements of the doctrine of divine simplicity are found in Augustine (354–430), Anselm (1033– 1109), and Aquinas (1225–74). Aquinas is often thought to represent the historical peak of the doctrine’s articulation and defense. Modern discussions usually reference his version as a standard, however, the roots of simplicity go back to the Ancient Greeks, well before its formal defense by representative thinkers of the three great monotheistic religions— Judaism, Christianity, and Islam. (The current English-speaking debates over simplicity usually refer to its Western, Christian developments, which are thus a focus of the present discussion.) Greek philosophers well before Socrates and Plato were fascinated by the idea of a fundamental unity underlying the vast multiplicity of individuals and their kinds and qualities. One idea proposed all things as sharing a common element, a universal substrate providing the stuff of which all things are made. Another idea proposed a being or principle characterized by a profound unity and inhabiting a realm above all else. Thales (640–546 B.C.E.) proposes water to be the common element from which all things in the universe are made. Anaximenes (588–524 B.C.E.) posits all material objects as ultimately constituted by compressed air of varying density. Parmenides (c. 515–c. 450 B.C.E.) presents an early Monism, the idea that all things are of a single substance. He holds that common to all things is their being, taken as a collective undifferentiated mass of all the being in the universe. He further introduces being as possessing an incorruptible perfection. Plato (428–348 B.C.E.) locates unity in the Forms. His metaphysics posits a supreme good constituting a unity beyond all ordinary being. The Platonic idea of a highest principle, combining supreme unity and utter perfection, strongly influenced Jewish and early Christian discussions of God’s supreme unity and perfection. Plato leaves the causal role of the supreme good somewhat vague. Aristotle (384–322 B.C.E.) posits the supreme being to be a subsisting and unchanging form that is also a first mover. Aristotle’s prime mover sits at the top of an efficient causal hierarchy governing all motion and change in the universe. Aristotle’s first mover is a simple, unchanging form that still causally affects other beings: in Aristotle’s case the heavenly spheres would move themselves in imitation of the divine perfection, resulting in the motions of terrestrial beings. Aristotle’s god is still considered ontologically finite by theistic standards and remains only a cosmic mover rather than a creator ex nihilo. The Platonic notion of a supreme perfection at a remove from all things and Aristotle’s causally efficacious, disembodied mind would combine to suggest a powerful model for Western theologians seeking language to describe God’s nature.

The Greek emphasis on a simple first principle figures prominently in the revival of classical Hellenistic philosophy at the close of the ancient world. Christianity is in its infancy when the Jewish theologian Philo of Alexandria (c. 30 B.C.E.–  50 C.E.) observes that it is already commonly accepted to think of God as Being itself and utterly simple. Philo is drawing on philosophical accounts of a supreme unity in describing God as uncomposite and eternal. He identifies this simple first being of the philosophers with the personal God of the Hebrew Scriptures who consciously creates things modeled after the divine ideas. Neoplatonist philosophers Plotinus (205–70) and later Proclus (410–85) will also posit a simple first principle. Plotinus’s Enneads speak of a One that exceeds all of the categories applicable to other things. Consequently it is unknowable and inexpressible (1962, V.3.13, VI.9.3). Plotinus voices an argument for the One’s simplicity that will emerge as a standard line of argument in later thinkers:

Even in calling it The First we mean no more than to express that it is the most absolutely simplex: it is Self-Sufficing only in the sense that it is not of that compound nature which would make it dependent upon any constituent [emphasis added]; it is the Self-Contained because everything contained in something alien must also exist by that alien. (1962, II.9.1)

For the One to have any metaphysical components is for them to account for the existence and character of the composite. Plotinus is working from the idea of a being that is utterly self-explanatory and thus is uncaused. A similar view of the first cause as lacking any internal or external causes will motivate Scholastic accounts of simplicity. Proclus’s Elements of Theology opens its analysis of the first principle by emphasizing its simplicity. (The work actually defends polytheism against the emerging Christianity.) This prioritizing of simplicity in the Elements is imitated in the anonymous Book of Causes and Dionysius’s On the Divine Names, two works that circulate to great effect in the medieval schools.

Christian theological speculation from the beginning views simplicity as essential for preserving God’s transcendence. The second-century Christian apologist Athenagoras of Athens argues that the Christian God by definition has no beginning; thus God is utterly indivisible and unchangeable. The Church Fathers—including Sts. Clement, Basil, and Cyril—see simplicity as preserving God’s transcendence and absolute perfection. St. John Damascene (c. 675–749) in book 3 of his An Exposition of the Orthodox Faith describes the divine nature as a unified single act (energeia) (1899). He allows it can be intellectually conceived under different aspects while remaining a simple being. Dionysius is the sixth-century Christian author of On the Divine Names. He long enjoyed authoritative status in the West after being mistaken for Dionysius of the Areopagus, whom St. Paul mentions in Acts. Unlike St. Augustine’s On the Trinity, Dionysius begins his account of the divine nature with  divine simplicity. Aquinas, in his last great theological synthesis, places simplicity at the head of the divine predicates (Summa theologiae Ia q.3). He first argues that simplicity is part and parcel to being a first cause. Simplicity then becomes a foundation for his account of the other major predicates of God’s nature (Burns 1993; Weigel 2008, ch. 1). However, well before Aquinas’s sophisticated treatment of the doctrine, representative thinkers of all three great monotheistic traditions recognize the doctrine of divine simplicity to be central to any credible account of a creator God’s ontological situation. Avicenna (980–1037), Averroes (1126–98), Anselm of Canterbury, Philo of Alexandria, and Moses Maimonides (1135–1204) all go out of their way to affirm the doctrine’s indispensability and systematic potential.

2. Doctrine and Implications

The doctrine proceeds by denying in God forms of ontological composition that are found in creatures. The forms of composition in question will vary with different ontological systems, particularly so in the modern cacophony of approaches to ontology. For now, it will help to stick with the claims as presented in the classic doctrine. First, God lacks any matter in his being. There are no physical parts. God is also completely independent of matter. Therefore, nothing about God depends on matter to be what it is. Second, the divine nature is not composed with something else. God is the divine nature, so there are no accidental features or other ontological accretions in God. All that God is, he is through and through. The identification of God with his nature is also understood to mean that God exhausts what it is to be divine. For instance, Socrates and Plato do not exhaust what it is to be human because each manifests different ways to be a human being. God cannot be any more divine than he is. This has the further implication that the divine nature is not sharable by multiple beings. Socrates and Plato both possess a human identity. The divine nature, however, is exclusive to God.

Another major tenet is that God is maximal existence. Aquinas calls God ipsum esse subsistens, subsistent existence itself. The Church Fathers from early on affirm God as the absolute Being. Augustine calls God “existence itself” (ipsum esse). God is the ultimate in being. God is not just the best among extant beings. There is no possible being that could be more or better than God is. Hence, God is maximal perfection and goodness. This also means God is infinite. God lacks the ontological limitations creatures have because God has no potentiality to be in a different state than he is. An immediate consequence of simplicity is that classical theism acknowledges severe limits on what created minds can know about God. Human beings can affirm propositions true of God, but no finite mind even approaches comprehending all that God is. A God that is simple is also immutable. A change requires that something in a being undergoes alternation and something else remains continuous. Yet a simple being does not have changeable components, and maximal being cannot be other than it is. There is no temporal unfolding of successive states and God is not subject to place. Thus a simple and immutable God is eternal, not subject to time. As Nicholas Wolterstoff aptly observes, divine simplicity seems to be the ontological basis for “grant[ing] a large number of other divine attributes,” and consequently “one’s interpretation of all God’s other attributes will have to be formed in light of that conviction” (Wolterstorff 1991, 531).

3. Motives

Proponents of the doctrine historically favor two lines of reasoning already mentioned. Classical theism wants to preserve God’s transcendence and also insure God is a genuine first cause. A truly uncaused first cause depends on nothing. Anselm, for instance, holds that God’s supreme perfection precludes division even “by any mind.” Yet in arguing for this state of perfection he uses the idea seen in Plotinus that components determine a composite to be what it is (Proslogion, ch. 19). Internal components are “causes” in the broad sense that the Greeks used [aition] to speak of that which determines something else to exist or be a certain way. (The narrowing of causation to efficient causation comes later.) Aquinas in his Summa theologiae similarly argues for simplicity: “Because every composite is posterior to its components, and depends upon them. However, God is the first being, as shown above [in the arguments for his existence]” (Ia q.3 a.7). Contemporary scholars often refer to God’s independence from all things as his aseity. God is not “self-caused,” as in causing himself to exist by a kind of ontological bootstrapping. Instead, he is a first cause that transcends everything and sustains everything in existence at all moments. This will be the kind of entity for which the question of its own causation or dependence cannot arise. Its nature is self-explanatory.

This idea of a first cause being utterly uncaused has its origin in a model of explanation that sees all things as subject to the principle of sufficient explanation. Everything in existence requires complete explanation for why it exists and why it has the properties it does. Something with a nature that cannot account for its own existence eventually refers back, in this model, to a single, self-explanatory first cause. (It is important to remember that the model here seeks causal explanations of particular entities. Gottfried Leibniz [1646–1716] by contrast defends the principle of a sufficient reason for the truth of all propositions. Some critics argue that this latter model poses the dilemma of having to create necessarily [not freely] or else God would have to create for reasons independent of God.) Philosophers will debate whether this model holds or whether such a first cause exists; however, such discussions fall outside the present scope. The point is that simplicity emerges from a certain view of the world’s causal intelligibility, combined with a strict reading of the unconditioned nature of the first uncaused cause. Marilyn Adams follows how these considerations about a first cause influence the doctrine of simplicity, in her study of simplicity beginning with the writings of Maimonides and ending with William of Ockham (c. 1287–1347) (1987, 930–60).

Classical theism sees simplicity as guaranteeing God’s transcendence. A simple being does not form any mixture or composition with anything else. This rules out pantheistic conceptions of God. God cannot be an aspect of the natural world, such as a world-soul. The Church Fathers, Augustine, and the Scholastics also understand simplicity as maintaining the infinite ontological distance regarded as definitive of transcendence. A complex and mutable being is not something Augustine, Maimonides, or Aquinas would call God. A composite and changeable being they see as much like the rest of creation and not transcending it in any robust sense. Christian ecclesiastical documents reflect similar concerns. Correspondence by Pope St. Leo the Great (reigned 440–61) affirms God’s simplicity and immutability. Simplicity is affirmed in the Council of Lateran IV (1215) and again as recently as Vatican I (1870). One might propose a lesser transcendence that allows for composition and change but that is another discussion. Classical theism remains consistent on the matter. Rising dissatisfaction with a simple and unchanging God in the West parallels the rising popularity of immanent, process-oriented conceptions of the divine nature (Rogers 1996, 165). (See Process Philosophy.) It was just such a dissatisfaction that led philosophers late in the last century to revive modern versions of age-old objections to the doctrine of divine simplicity.

4. Difficulties

Contemporary objections to the intrinsic coherence of the doctrine are interrelated. They rely on similar assumptions about the doctrine and its categories. One line of critique cites the intrinsic claims of the doctrine as incoherent because calling God subsistent existence does not make sense. Another line of critique looks at multiple predicates as introducing divisions in God. The relevant predicates here signify the presence of a positive reality and include such traditional predicates as God is ‘good,’ ‘wise,’ and ‘living.’. Positive divine predicates contrast with negative ones, such as calling God ‘immaterial’ or ‘immutable.’ Here the term’s immediate significance is to deny a reality or situation. In this case the terms signify the absence of matter and change.

Alvin Plantinga’s critique of simplicity in his Does God Have a Nature (1980) has become a touchstone in the contemporary debates. Earlier versions of most of Plantinga’s objections can be found in other authors (Bennett 1969; Ross 1969; LaCroix 1977; Martin 1976; Wainwright 1979). Before that, discussions of simplicity percolated though other traditions, such as in religious schools and seminaries. The recent attention to these issues by analytic philosophers is not as novel as might be thought. Variations of them are probably as old as the doctrine of divine simplicity itself.

One of Plantinga’s major criticisms is that simplicity is incompatible with God appearing to have multiple attributes. According to the doctrine, “[God] doesn’t merely have a nature or essence; he just is that nature, ... [and] each of his properties is identical with each of his that God has but one property.” But this “seems flatly incompatible with the obvious fact that God has several properties; he has power and mercifulness, say, neither of which is identical with the other” (1980, 46–47). Two objections are in play. First, positive predicates normally signify distinct features or aspects in things. Whatever makes Socrates wise differs from what makes him good. Would not God also have distinct properties? Plantinga’s second objection notes that God’s nature is identical  with what is predicated of it. Socrates is not his goodness or wisdom but  God is identical with his properties (which are identical with each other). Yet, no subject is its properties, much less a property, period. Similar versions of this critique are elsewhere (see, for example, Bennett 1969; Mann 1982).

Plantinga sees an even more basic problem here. Plantinga thinks properties and natures are abstract objects: “Still further we have been speaking of [God’s] own properties; but of course there is the rest of the Platonic menagerie—the propositions, properties, numbers, sets, possible worlds, and all the rest” (1980, 35). Properties and natures are abstract objects that neither subsist as individual things, such as oak trees and cats, nor inhere in individuals. This view of properties and natures as abstracta is a common one in the analytic tradition. It flourished during the middle and later decades of the last century and appears still widely held, if less dominant. If Plantinga is right, nothing divine is a property or nature:

No property could have created the world; no property could be omniscient, or, indeed, know anything at all. If God is a property, then he isn’t a person but a mere abstract object; he has no knowledge, awareness, power, love or life. So taken, the simplicity doctrine seems an utter mistake. (47)

Properties in this view are things individuals can exemplify or instantiate, but not actually be. A painted wooden fence, for instance, exemplifies the property of being red. But redness itself is an abstract object separate from the individuals exemplifying it. Variations on this criticism in Plantinga are raised by Richard Gale (1991, 23) and Christopher Hughes (1989, 10–20) among others.

There is an additional line of objection here that commentators often miss. Plantinga takes it for granted God is a person: “If God is a property, then he isn’t a person but a mere abstract object . . .” (1980, 47). Persons are not abstract objects. Moreover, persons are composite and changeable. They have faculties of understanding and volition that involve composition and a temporal sequence of states. So nothing simple can be a person. Yet God is obviously a person, according to Plantinga and others. He is obviously then not simple. David Hume (1711–76) argues along a similar line. A simple and immutable being has no mind, for “a mind whose acts and sentiments and ideas are not distinct and successive . . . has no thought, no reason, no will, no sentiment, no love, no hatred; or in a word, is no mind at all” (1980, part 4). A simple God is not a person, nor could God have the sort of mind persons have.

Another attack on the intrinsic coherence of the doctrine cites the claim that God is Being or existence itself. This basic claim appears early on in the doctrine’s history and is held by contemporary defenders of the doctrine (see, for example, Miller 1996; Davies 2004, 174–75). But detractors find the claim puzzling at best. Christopher Hughes speaks for many in calling it “perhaps the single most baffling claim Aquinas makes about God” (1989, 4). Anthony Kenny’s analysis concludes in even stronger terms by calling the position “nothing but sophistry and illusion” (2002, 194). A. N. Prior criticizes the view as simply ill-formed, that it “is just bad grammar, a combining of words that fails to make them mean—like ‘cat no six’” (1955, 5).

The theological controversy is rooted in a prior philosophical controversy over what it means to predicate existence of objects. According to one prevalent view of existence, saying “Fido exists” adds nothing to Fido. It adds no determinate feature the way predicating ‘hairy’ or ‘four-legged’ does. Existence then is not a real property. If existence is treated as a constituent of things, then there is also a certain paradox involving the denial something exists. To say “Fido does not exist” seems to presuppose Fido is there to be talked about, but then does not exist. This is self-contradictory. Given these apparent oddities, some philosophers decided existence is not predicated of extra-mental things but of concepts. Gottlob Frege (1848–1925) will say that asserting “There exists no four-sided triangle” is just to assign the concept of such a triangle the number zero. C. J. F. Williams echoes the Fregean view in his critique of God as just "to be’" “No doubt the question ‘What is it for x to be?’ is, by Frege’s standards, and they are the right standards, ill formed. To be cannot for anything be the same as to be alive, since the latter is something that can be said of objects, while the former is used to say something of concepts” (1997, 227). This modern analysis of existence goes back to Immanuel Kant’s (1724–1804) critique of Rene Descartes’ (1596–1650) version of the ontological argument. Kant seems to have read Pierre Gassendi’s (1592–1665) analysis of Descartes’ argument. Gassendi holds that existence does not qualify as a property; it is not a property of God or of anything else.  If existence is not really saying anything directly about things, then it is nonsense to say God is literally just existence.

But suppose one allows that existence might be some sort of extra-mental aspect of things. There seem to be other problems in identifying God with existence. Existence never just occurs by itself in some rarefied form. One affirms the existence of dogs and begonias and such. Anthony Kenny notes, “If told simply that Flora is, I am not told whether she is a girl or a goddess or a cyclone, though she may be any of these. But God’s esse is esse which permits no further specification. Other things are men or dogs or clouds, but God is not anything, he just is” (2000, 58). How could existence itself subsist? Even if there could be something like mere existence, then surely God could not be some rarified glob of existence. God would seem to have many other properties. Thus, the problem of calling God subsistent existence returns one to the original problem of predicating multiple properties.

These objections represent the bulk of the objections commonly leveled at the doctrine’s basic coherence. One might summarize them as follows:

(a) God has several properties. Simplicity must deny this.

(b) Multiple properties occur as distinct from each other in things. Simplicity problematically says they are identical in God.

(c) God is a subsisting, individual thing. Properties do not subsist.

(d) In fact, properties, essences, natures are abstracta. God is not an abstract object.

(e) God is a person. Persons are ontologically complex.

(f) Simplicity says God is Being or subsistent existence. Existence is not a property, like being round.

(g) Nothing at all can be just existence.

(h) If God is some kind of rarified existence, this raises the same problem in (a).

These difficulties are hardly exhaustive. Still, together they account for much of the contemporary opposition to simplicity. They also embody certain assumptions other kinds of objections tend to use. What follows can only be a sketch of some common responses to the above objections. Another task will be to demonstrate how proponents of classical simplicity tend to invoke different background assumptions from its critics.

5. Responses

a. Ontology

Looking at the contemporary ontology in which these objections are couched is a good place to start. Plantinga considers natures, properties, essences, and the like to be causally inert abstract objects that are separate from particular individual things. In this scheme, saying God is a nature is a category mistake. It is like referring to someone’s poodle as a prime number.

However, classical simplicity uses a metaphysics that sees the predication of natures and properties differently. Natures, essences, and properties are in this view constituents of things. Nicholas Wolterstorff characterizes this difference in ontological outlook in the following manner:

The theistic identity claims [in simplicity] were put forward by thinkers working within a very different ontological style from ours. They worked within an ontology I shall call constituent ontology. [Contemporary philosophers] typically work within a style that might be called relation ontology....Claims which are baffling in one style will sometimes seem relatively straightforward in another. (1991, 540–41)

Contemporary ontologies of this sort regard natures and properties as abstracta, which individual objects only “have” in the sense of exemplifying or instantiating them. Medieval proponents of simplicity regard such things as natures and properties as entities that actually inhere in the individuals that have them. Wolterstorff observes,

An essence is [for twentieth-century philosophers] an abstract entity. For a medieval, I suggest, the essence of nature was just as concrete as that of which it is the nature....Naturally the medieval will speak of something as having a certain nature. But the having here is to be understood as having as one of its constituents . . . for [contemporary philosophers], having an essence is . . . exemplifying it.” (1991, 541–42)

Many medieval thinkers would say that Socrates and Plato both have a human nature. This means there is an intrinsic set of properties constituting their identity as human beings, instead of being some other kind of natural object. Despite having the same nature, Socrates and Plato are of course distinct individuals. How so? Each individual is made out of a different parcel, or quantity, of matter. Each has different accidental features (non-essential properties). Socrates and Plato are thus two separate composites. Moreover, each has his individual humanity. The nature present in each is individualized or “particularized” in virtue of being in separate lumps of matter, and secondarily by the presence of different accidental, individualized features inhering the individual composite substance. Humanity is not an exact replica in each, in the way new Lincoln pennies might look the same except for being in different places. In this ontological outlook, a mind can form a general concept of human nature in abstraction from its various particularized instances. But this common, abstract humanity is only an object of thought. There is no non-individualized human nature outside of minds producing abstract concepts. For this ontological perspective, there is no Platonic human nature outside of individual human beings. One might give a similar account of various properties Socrates and Plato have. Each has white skin. Each composite is white in its own particular way. One can say here that Socrates’ whiteness inheres in this composite, Plato’s in that one. The way each is white will thus look similar but also slightly different. One can form an abstract, general concept of being white that abstracts from its particular instances. However, the medievals believe such mental abstractions hardly commit one to ontological abstracta apart from minds or individual instances. Consequently, humanity and whiteness are not part of a menagerie of Platonic entities separate from the individual composite beings that exemplify them.

Similarly, classical ontology holds that the divine nature is not an abstract object. The divine nature, or the what-it-is to be God, is not separate from the being that is God. Since simplicity denies matter and accidents in God, here, as Aquinas explains in Summa theologiae, is the extraordinary case where a certain entity just is its own nature:

God is the same as his essence or nature . . . in things composed of matter and form, the nature or essence must differ from the suppositum [that is, the whole subject]....Hence the thing which is a man has something more in it than [its] humanity....On the other hand, in things not composed of matter and form, in which individualization is not due to individual matter...the forms themselves should be subsisting supposita. Therefore suppositum and nature are in them are identified. Since God is not composed of matter and form, he must be his own Godhead, his own life, and whatever else is predicated of him. (Ia q.3 a.3)

Socrates is more than his nature; a human being is a material entity and has non-essential features in addition to his nature. God just is a nature, which does not form a composite with anything else. Such an extraordinary being is difficult to imagine or know much about. But, if natures and properties can be individual components of things, then simplicity hardly makes God an abstract object. Some commentators acknowledge the different approach classical ontology has toward natures and properties, but raise objections to it (for example, Hughes 1989, 12–20). Defenders of simplicity do not find such reservations compelling, and they make the further point that simplicity at bottom never considers God an abstract object (Bergmann and Brower 2006; Leftow 1990, 593–94). The main point is that one’s own ontology might not be that of another age. A technical assessment of these rival approaches to ontology might be left for a longer discussion (Leftow 2003). One should also keep in mind that contemporary defenders of simplicity show a variety of ontological predilections. Some mix historical and contemporary ontological views without seeing incoherence in this (for example, Vallicella 1992; Miller, 1996). Adjudicating among rival ontologies, however, is the substance of a much longer discussion. (For more, see the cited sources in this paragraph.)

b. Persons

Modern authors sometimes speak of God as a person (for example, Plantinga 1980, 47, 57). If God is a person and if simplicity leaves no room for being a person, then simplicity seems incompatible with believing in God. Certainly there are reasons for calling God a person. Classical theism predicates of God such things commonly associated with persons as knowledge and a will. This is not all. Human persons and their cognitive faculties are composite and changeable. So, if persons are the model for God being a person, then simplicity runs into the problems Plantinga and Hume mention above. But then it would be odd if Jewish, Christian, and Islamic thinkers over the centuries momentarily forgot God is like a human person when they affirm God’s simplicity. In fact, referring to God as a person is more complicated than one might think.

Many theists nowadays take it for granted God is a person, albeit a kind of disembodied super-powerful one. Brian Davies observes that the formula ‘God is a person’ “is by no means a traditional one. It does not occur in the Bible. It is foreign to the Fathers and to writers up to and beyond the Middle Ages. Not does it occur in the creeds” (2000, 560).  Judaism believes man is in the image of God because man has understanding and free choice. Yet that is a long way from God actually being a person, much less in the way persons are persons. (Man is in the image of God but not vice versa.) Islam regards the ninety-nine names of Allah as titles of honor and not at all descriptions of God’s essence. The Christian Trinity speaks of three persons of one substance (ousia or substantia). It does not say the Godhead itself is a person, or that God is three persons in one person.

Stanley Rudman argues that thinking of the Godhead itself as a person is a relatively recent development (1998, ch. 8). It is mostly absent from Western theology before the eighteenth century. William Paley (1741–1805) and Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834) provide early examples of trying out the idea. The nineteenth century sees an emphasis on God as a person or personality gain considerable momentum. In the present day, the eminent philosopher of religion Richard Swinburne does not find it particularly controversial to say, “That God is a person yet one without a body seems the most elementary claim of theism” (1999, 99). The difficulty lies in how one understands predicating ‘person.’ The modern sensibility seems to regard God as a person not altogether dissimilar to the way Socrates is a person. God is a disembodied mind that performs discursive thinking and makes a succession of distinct choices.

Far different is how Aquinas sees the predication of ‘person’ to God. He allows one can use the term. But here it signifies in a manner unlike its everyday use (Summa theologiae Ia q.29 a.4). It never applies univocally of God and creatures, but must be differently conceived in each case (q. 29 a.4 ad 4). Aquinas notes that ‘person’ signifies “what is most perfect in all of nature—that is, a subsistent individual of a rational nature.” Working with this general idea, God is called a person because “his essence contains every perfection,” including supreme intelligence, and because “the dignity of the divine nature excels every dignity” (q.29 a.4 ad 2). ‘Person’ thus applies to God in a manner eminently surpassing creatures. The overall context suggests Aquinas regards the term as mainly honorific, in the way God is thought of as a king on account of his rule over creation.

God is not a person if that implies any diminution of his maximal perfection. God does not go from being potentially in another state to acquiring that state. God has a rational nature, but only “if reason be taken to mean, not discursive thought, but in a general sense, an intelligent nature” (q.29 a.4 ad 3). Human persons need not be the definitive model for persons. If they are, God surely is not a person. Predicates God shares with persons, such as intellect and will, apply only by analogy. The predicates must abstract from, or be stripped of, any implication of change, composition, or imperfection. The language of personality applies with the realization that, as Brian Davies notes,

Our language for what is personal (and our primary understanding of this) comes from our knowledge of human beings. And we ought to be struck by a difference between what it takes to be a human being and what it must take to be God. . . . [They do not] reflect a knowledge of God as he is in himself. (2000, 561)

The modern tendency to think of God as a person leads to anthropomorphic interpretations of traditional divine predicates, and this arguably misses the intent of the original proponents of simplicity. A similar problem involves a lack of familiarity with the religious epistemology surrounding the doctrine.

c. Negations

Simplicity traditionally emphasizes God as profoundly unlike created beings. Classical philosophical theology frequently approaches divine predication using negative theology. God is seen as profoundly unknown as he is in himself. Much of what can be affirmed about God expresses what God is not, and in general how unlike and beyond created things God is. This preserves a sense of God’s infinite ontological distance from creatures. It also ensures predicates are not applied as if categories used for persons and everyday objects apply in roughly the same way to God.

Negative predicates such as ‘simple’ and ‘immutable’ signify the removal of features commonly found in created things. Negations should not immediately suggest positive imagery of what God is like. A temptation is to think these terms mean what it would be like for, say, an animate object or a human being to lack such features. Everyday human experience does not associate a lack of complexity with richness and perfection. One imagines dull uniformity, like a bowl of tepid porridge. Aquinas realizes this and follows his presentation of simplicity with God’s unlimited perfection and goodness. Similar caution applies to thinking about God’s immutability. Grace Jantzen observes of an unchangeable God: “A living God cannot be static: life implies change . . . [divine immutability] would preclude divine responsiveness and must rather be taken as steadfastness of character” (1983, 573). However, classical theists will argue that the correct image here should not be that of a static and inert physical object. The historical sources do not suggest this, and often go to great lengths to mitigate against this confusion. God has unlimited perfection, statues and rocks do not. As Brian Davies observes, "living" predicated of God does not mean a literal-minded image of biological life and physical change. Instead it acknowledges God’s independence from things and being a source of change in them (Davies 2004, 165–66).

Classical simplicity maintains that God is beyond knowledge of what he is like in himself. Concepts deriving from everyday experiences of physical objects remain profoundly inadequate to the reality of God. An expert might acquire a good sense of how complicated machinery works. By contrast, Aquinas introduces simplicity by saying it is safer to consider the ways God is unlike the created order, rather than like it: “Now we cannot know how God is, but only how he is not; we must therefore consider the ways in which God does not exist, rather than the ways in which he does” (Summa theologiae Ia q.3 introduction). The context suggests one cannot know the essence of God, or have any direct acquaintance of it the way one knows physical things. Positive predications of the form ”God is A” can allow readers to confuse the semantic distinction between the subject and predicate with a real distinction between God and separate properties. Plotinus operates with a similar caution in denying one can properly even say the One is (1962, V.4.1). This does not mean the One is non-extant. It signals that the One is beyond anything that could be associated with the world of changing and composite beings. Boethius discusses God as a simple being and then qualifies this by saying that God is not to be thought of as a subject. Dionysius (1957) shows an affinity with this position in his On the Divine Names.

Moses Maimonides also displays great caution in his account of simplicity and divine predication. For Maimonides, even positive predicates apply to God with severe qualifications to avoid compromising God’s simplicity (2000, ch. 50–58). Scripture enjoins the believer to affirm God is good, wise, just, and such. Yet positive predicates can only express that (a) God is the ultimate cause of certain good qualities, or (b) the predicate is a disguised negation of something from God. ‘God is good’ might mean God is the cause of good things. ‘God is living’ assures that God is not like something dead or ineffective. Subsequent thinkers will point out difficulties with this view of positive predicates. Saying nothing positive directly about God allows some strange expressions. God is the cause of everything. There are also innumerable things God is not. Thus God might be called a ‘lion’ to avoid the impression of weakness, or ‘quick-witted’ to preclude the impression that God is dull.

Aquinas will cite the Aristotelian dictum (Physics 184a23–184b12) that to affirm something exists is to have at least a very partial and incomplete notion what it is or is like. In addition, some modern commentators point out an agnosticism about God’s essence that can go too far. ‘Simple’ is a negative predicate. But the doctrine implies God is unsurpassed perfection and ultimate being. The absence of something like direct acquaintance with the divine nature could still allow positive things to be affirmed of it. This returns the discussion to the problem of assigning multiple predicates.

d. Multiple Predicates

Multiple predicates differ from each other in meaning. Must they imply multiple properties that are components in God? Maimonides handles this by denying that positive predicates of God actually refer to the divine nature. There is another way. Positive predicates are affirmed of the divine essence, but do not pick out multiple properties in God. God does not have properties, strictly speaking, if one has distinct component features in mind. The undivided reality of God confirms predicates that differ in meaning but all refer to the whole nature. Each predicate corresponds to a way of considering the divine reality. Yet none of these affirmations, taken individually or collectively, imply division. None exhaustively express the maximal perfection to which they all refer. One might use the contemporary distinction between the sense of a predicate, its meaning or conceptual associations, from its reference, the thing or things to which a predicate refers. The divine predicates differ in sense, but share the simple nature as their common referent. (Modern theories of reference differ from medieval theories of signification. But here the basic idea need not do harm.) Aquinas remarks on these predicates:

God, however, as considered in himself is altogether one and simple; but never­theless our intellect knows him by diverse conceptions, because it cannot see him as he is in himself. But, although it understands him under diverse conceptions, it knows that all these conceptions correspond (respondet) [emphasis added] to one and the same simple thing. Therefore, this plurality, which is [a plurality] according to reason, is represented by the plurality of subject and predicate; and the intellect represents the unity by composition. (Summa theologiae, Ia q.13 a.12)

"Good" and "living" are associated with two different concepts. Applied to creatures they signify distinct, inherent properties. Applied to God they are both true, but the ontological basis of their truth is the whole of what God is. The predicates retain their creaturely modes of signifying, where the mind associates the predicate with a limited and accidental property. Aquinas will say each signifies a perfection creatures have in common with God. John Damascene uses the metaphor of God being an infinite ocean of perfection, which can answer to distinctive intellectual conceptualizations while remaining undivided and unlimited in itself.

This does not mean a person grasps what it is about God or “in” God (a misleading expression) corresponding to the predicate. One can say that certain predicates should be affirmed, but claiming to know just what they signify at the level of the divine is another matter. This raises the question of what features inhering in created things would have in common with the divine reality. God’s nature seems to stretch the identity of what is predicated beyond its original significance. Marilyn Adams (1987) has suggested that the real issue with simplicity is not that multiple predicates imply composition. The problem is how the identity of the perfection signified is maintained between its created and divine applications. Aquinas notes that divine perfection differs from created perfection not just in degree. Since God is simple and maximal perfection, an entirely different mode of existence is involved. This is why he will say the predicates apply to God analogously, and not univocally, as "wise" applies to Plato and Socrates. Proponents of simplicity use a variety of solutions to show how the same predicate might refer to God and creatures. Such approaches can widely vary, according to an individual’s views on ontology and religious language (see, for example, Miller 1996; Klima 2001; Teske 1981; Vallicella, 1992; Weigel 2008, ch.6).

e. Existence

Similar considerations about divine predication can make sense of saying God is existence. As noted, contemporary philosophers often deny existence is predicated of things (Williams 1997; Kenny 2002, 110–11). Others question this. They note that the Fregean view of existence originally flourished in response to long-faded controversies in late-nineteenth- and early-twentieth-century theories of quantification and reference (Smith 1961, 118–33; Klima 2001; Knuuttila 1986; Miller 1996, 15–27). Gyula Klima observes that medieval theories of signification predicate existence of things in the world. They also speak of entities that do not exist without generating the obscure paradoxes modern assumptions about reference seem to (2001; Spade 1982). Some philosophers think that predicating existence of objects does say something non-trivial about them. Just because existence is not a determinate property, such as being orange, does not mean its predication to things adds nothing of significance. John Smith argues in this vein that “It is obvious that at least one considerable difference between lions and unicorns is that the former do exist while the latter do not,” and this need not involve some well-defined concept of existence (1961, 123). Philosophers aware of a variety of semantic theories now floating around English-speaking philosophy see the exclusively Fregean interpretation of existence as commanding less assent than it once did.

Fortunately, a sensible reading of the claim can be found without getting philosophers to agree on what existence is. First, God is not the being of all things collectively considered. This is just to have a universal concept of being that abstracts from individual beings and their determinations. But God is no lump sum of existence, which would be pantheistic. Second, saying God is existence does not mean God is some bland, characterless property of existence that one sees as common to cats, trees, and ballpoint pens. Instead, speaking of God as existence itself is a kind of shorthand for God’s ontology. Saying God’s essence is to exist expresses God’s independence from creatures as the uncaused source of all else. God depends on nothing for the being that God is. It also signals God’s supreme perfection. God’s maximal perfection and supreme unity surpass all individual beings and their limitations. Augustine will say in On the Trinity that because God is supreme among all beings, God is said to exist in the highest sense of the expression, “for it is the same thing to God to be, and to be great” (1963, V.10.11). Finally, Aquinas says that God is the full and exhaustive expression of the divine nature (Summa theologiae, Ia q.2 a.3). No other possible being rivals the divine plenitude. So, nothing else can be God. Calling God subsistent existence underscores God as (a) uncaused and independent, (b) maximal perfection, (c) simple, (d) and one.

6. Conclusion

Assessing the doctrine of divine simplicity is far more complicated than lining up objections and replies. The doctrine’s currents run deep in the history of Western philosophical and religious thought,  predating the rise of Jewish and Christian philosophical theology. The doctrine is still regarded by many as an indispensable tenet of classical theism. Simplicity speaks to one’s fundamental understanding of God. Philosophers and theologians will continue to reach widely varying conclusions about simplicity,  and the challenges it poses in a variety of areas insure it will continue to receive much attention for the foreseeable future.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. William Ockham. 2 vols. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1987.
    • Comprehensive overview of Ockham’s (c. 1287–1347) thought and contrasting medieval positions. Extensive discussion of medieval views of simplicity.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Monologion. In Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, edited and translated by Brian Davies and Gareth Evans, 5–81. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • Early medieval account of simplicity and the classic divine predicates.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Proslogion. In Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, edited and translated by Brian Davies and Gareth Evans, 82–104. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • Aquinas, Thomas. Summa Theologica. (also Summa theologiae) Translated by the English Dominican Fathers. New York: Benziger Brothers, 1947.
    • A comprehensive medieval defense of simplicity and other classic divine predicates.
  • Aquinas, Thomas. On the Power of God. Translated by the English Dominican Fathers. Westminster, MD: Newman Press, 1952.
    • Extensive treatment of the problem of simplicity and multiple predicates.
  • Augustine. On the Trinity. Translated by Stephen McKenna. Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1963.
    • His handling of simplicity proves influential in later, medieval accounts.
  • Bennett, Daniel. “The Divine Simplicity.” Journal of Philosophy 69, no. 19 (1969): 628–37.
    • Examines analytic objections to a simple God having multiple properties ascribed.
  • Bergmann, Michael, and Jeffrey Brower. “A Theistic Argument against Platonism (and in Support of Truthmakers and Divine Simplicity)” In Oxford Studies in Metaphysics 2, edited by Dean Zimmerman, 357–86. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • Argues against properties having to be abstract objects.
  • The Book of Causes. Anonymous. Translated by Dennis Brand. Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press, 1984.
    • Thought to be by an unknown Arabic author abstracting from Proclus’s Elements of Theology.
  • Burns, Peter. “The Status and Function of Divine Simpleness in Summa theologiae Ia, qq.2–13.” Thomist 57, no. 1 (1993): 1–26.
    • Discusses the place and influence of simplicity in Aquinas’s account of the divine nature.
  • Davies, Brian. “A Modern Defence of Divine Simplicity.” In Philosophy of Religion: A Guide and Anthology, edited by Brian Davies, 549–64. Oxford: Oxford Uni­versity Press, 2000.
    • A sympathetic treatment of the compatibility of simplicity with other predicates.
  • Davies, Brian. Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion. 3rd ed. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.
  • Dionysius. Dionysius the Areopagite “On the Divine Names” and “The Mystical Theology.” Translated by C. Rolt. London: SPCK, 1957.
    • Influential on later medieval thought about simplicity and the divine nature.
  • Gale, Richard. On the Nature and Existence of God. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
    • A critical response to analytic defenses of theism.
  • Hughes, Christopher. On a Complex Theory of a Simple God. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1989.
    • Critiques Aquinas’ account of simplicity and suggests another account.
  • Hume, David. Dialogues concerning Natural Religion. Edited by Richard Popkin. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1980.
    • Historically regarded as a powerful critique of the classic concept of God and arguments for God’s existence.
  • Jantzen, Grace. “Time and Timelessness.” In A New Dictionary of Christianity, edited by Alan Richardson and John Bowden. London: SCM, 1983.
    • Briefly critiques an eternal and immutable God.
  • John of Damascus (John Damascene). An Exposition of the Orthodox Faith. Translated by E.W. Watson and L. Pullan. In Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers, second series, vol. 9. Edited by Philip Schaff and Henry Wace. Buffalo, NY: Christian Literature, 1899.
    • Systematic discussion of the divine nature and human knowledge of God. Influential precursor to Scholastic discussions.
  • Kenny, Anthony. Aquinas on Being. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • Argues for the incoherence of Aquinas’s ontology of existence.
  • Klima, Gyula. “Existence and Reference in Medieval Logic.” In New Essays in Free Logic, edited by Alexander Hieke and Edgar Morscher, 197–226. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic, 2001.
    • Sophisticated technical defense of some medieval theories of existence and predication.
  • Knuuttila, Simo. “Being qua Being in Thomas Aquinas and John Duns Scotus.” In The Logic of Being: Historical Studies, edited by Simo Knuuttila and Jaakko Hintikka, 201–22. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic, 1986.
    • Explanation and defense of Aquinas’s views on existence.
  • LaCroix, Richard. “Augustine on the Simplicity of God.” New Scholasticism 51, no. 4 (1977): 453–69.
    • Critique of Augustine’s account.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Is God an Abstract Object.” Noûs 24, no. 4 (1990): 581–98.
    • Examines the role of theories of properties in accounts of the divine nature.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Aquinas on Attributes.” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 11, no. 1 (2003): 1–41.
    • Explanation and defense of Aquinas on divine predication.
  • Maimonides, Moses ben. The Guide for the Perplexed. Rev. ed. Translated by M. Friedlander. Mineola, NY: Dover, 2000.
    • An early medieval Jewish thinker’s account of the divine nature. Influential in subsequent Scholastic discussions.
  • Mann, William. “Divine Simplicity.” Religious Studies 18 (1982): 451–71.
    • Critique of divine simplicity and often cited in contemporary discussions.
  • Martin, C.B. “God, the Null Set and Divine Simplicity.” In The Challenge to Religion Today, edited by John King-Farlow, 138–43. New York: Science History, 1976.
    • Poses objections to simplicity in an analytic vein.
  • Miller, Barry. A Most Unlikely God: A Philosophical Inquiry into the Nature of God. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1996.
    • Sympathetic reconstruction of the classic concept of God using analytic philosophy.
  • Morris, Thomas. “On God and Mann: A View of Divine Simplicity.” Religious Studies 21, no. 3 (1985): 299–318.
    • A well-known reply to Mann (1982).
  • Owen, H. P. Concepts of Deity. London: MacMillan, 1971.
    • Comprehensive survey of conceptions of the divine nature. Defends classical monotheism.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Does God Have a Nature? Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press, 1980.
    • A monograph-length analytic critique of divine simplicity and the classic concept of God. The text serves as a touchstone for contemporary philosophical debates over simplicity.
  • Plotinus. Enneads. 3rd ed. Translated by Stephen MacKenna. Revised by B. S. Page. New York: Pantheon Books, 1962.
    • Neoplatonic treatment of the divine nature.
  • Prior, A. N. “Can Religion Be Discussed?” in New Essays in Philosophical Theology, edited by Anthony Flew and Alasdair MacIntyre, 1–11. London: S.C.M. Press, 1955.
    • Critical assessment of some traditional theological positions.
  • Proclus. The Elements of Theology. Translated with a commentary by E. Dodds. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1933.
  • Rogers, Katherin. “The Traditional Doctrine of Divine Simplicity.” Religious Studies 32, no. 2 (1996): 165–86.
    • Survey of some problems classical simplicity raises.
  • Ross, James. Philosophical Theology. New York: Bobbs-Merrill, 1969.
    • Assesses traditional philosophical theology by combining an analytic approach with a grasp of Scholastic positions.
  • Rudman, Stanley. Concepts of Person and Christian Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • Discusses the idea of the Godhead as a person and its recent history.
  • Smith, John. Reason and God: Encounters of Philosophy with Religion. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1961.
    • Examines some traditional and contemporary views in philosophical theology. Defends existence as a valid predicate in theological contexts.
  • Spade, Paul. “The Semantics of Terms.” In The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, edited by Norman Kretzmann, Anthony Kenny, and Jan Pinborg, 188–96. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
    • Discussion of medieval semantic theories.
  • Stump, Eleonore, and Norman Kretzmann. “Absolute Simplicity.” Faith and Philosophy 2, no. 4 (1985): 353–82.
    • Defends the compatibility of simplicity with divine power and willing.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
    • Sympathetic treatment of traditional theistic philosophical positions.
  • Teske, Roland. “Properties of God and the Predicaments in De Trinitate V.” Modern Schoolman 59 (1981): 1–19.
    • Examines multiple predicates of a simple God in Augustine’s work.
  • Vallicella, William. “Divine Simplicity: A New Defense.” Faith and Philosophy 9, no. 4 (1992): 471–78.
    • A contemporary analytic defense of divine simplicity.
  • Wainwright, William. “Augustine on God’s Simplicity: A Reply.” New Scholasticism 53, no. 1 (1979): 124–27.
  • Weigel, Peter. Aquinas on Simplicity: An Investigation into the Foundations of His Philosophical Theology. Frankfurt: Peter Lang, 2008.
    • Examines the ontological background to Aquinas’s account of simplicity and philosophical theology.
  • Williams, C. J. F. “Being.” In A Companion to Philosophy of Religion, edited by Philip Quinn and Charles Taliaferro, 223–28. Oxford: Black­well, 1997.
    • Critique of predicating existence in theological contexts.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. “Divine Simplicity.” In Philosophical Perspectives 5: Philosophy of Religion 1991, edited by James Tomberlin, 531–52. Atascadero, CA: Ridgefield, 1991.
    • A critical assessment of some problems raised by simplicity and often cited in contemporary discussions.

Author Information

Peter Weigel
Washington College

The New Atheists

The New Atheists are authors of early twenty-first century books promoting atheism. These authors include Sam Harris, Richard Dawkins, Daniel Dennett, and Christopher Hitchens. The “New Atheist” label for these critics of religion and religious belief emerged out of journalistic commentary on the contents and impacts of their books. A standard observation is that New Atheist authors exhibit an unusually high level of confidence in their views.  Reviewers have noted that these authors tend to be motivated by a sense of moral concern and even outrage about the effects of religious beliefs on the global scene. It is difficult to identify anything philosophically unprecedented in their positions and arguments, but the New Atheists have provoked considerable controversy with their body of work.

In spite of their different approaches and occupations (only Dennett is a professional philosopher), the New Atheists tend to share a general set of assumptions and viewpoints. These positions constitute the background theoretical framework that is known as the New Atheism. The framework has a metaphysical component, an epistemological component, and an ethical component.  Regarding the metaphysical component, the New Atheist authors share the central belief that there is no supernatural or divine reality of any kind.  The epistemological component is their common claim that religious belief is irrational. The moral component is the assumption that there is a universal and objective secular moral standard. This moral component sets them apart from other prominent historical atheists such as Nietzsche and Sartre, and it plays a pivotal role in their arguments because it is used to conclude that religion is bad in various ways, although Dennett is more reserved than the other three.

The New Atheists make substantial use of the natural sciences in both their criticisms of theistic belief and in their proposed explanations of its origin and evolution. They draw on science for recommended alternatives to religion. They believe empirical science is the only (or at least the best) basis for genuine knowledge of the world, and they insist that a belief can be epistemically justified only if it is based on adequate evidence. Their conclusion is that science fails to show that there is a God and even supports the claim that such a being probably does not exist. What science will show about religious belief, they claim, is that this belief can be explained as a product of biological evolution. Moreover, they think that it is possible to live a satisfying non-religious life on the basis of secular morals and scientific discoveries.

Table of Contents

  1. Faith and Reason
  2. Arguments For and Against God’s Existence
  3. Evolution and Religious Belief
  4. The Moral Evaluation of Religion
  5. Secular Morality
  6. Alleged Divine Revelations
  7. Secular Fulfillment
  8. Criticism of the New Atheists
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Faith and Reason

Though it is difficult to find a careful and precise definition of “faith” in the writings of the New Atheists, it is possible to glean a general characterization of this cognitive attitude from various things they say about it. In The Selfish Gene, Richard Dawkins states that faith is blind trust without evidence and even against the evidence. He follows up in The God Delusion with the claim that faith is an evil because it does not require justification and does not tolerate argument. Whereas the former categorization suggests that Dawkins thinks that faith is necessarily non-rational or even irrational, the latter description seems to imply that faith is merely contingently at odds with rationality. Harris’s articulation of the nature of faith is closer to Dawkins’ earlier view. He says that religious faith is unjustified belief in matters of ultimate concern.  According to Harris, faith is the permission religious people give one another to believe things strongly without evidence. Hitchens says that religious faith is ultimately grounded in wishful thinking. For his part, Dennett implies that belief in God cannot be reasonable because the concept of God is too radically indeterminate for the sentence “God exists” to express a genuine proposition.  Given this, Dennett questions whether any of the people who claim to believe in God actually do believe God exists. He thinks it more likely that they merely profess belief in God or “believe in belief” in God (they believe belief in God is or would be a good thing). According to this view there can be no theistic belief that is also reasonable or rational. Critics point out that the New Atheist assumption that religious faith is irrational is at odds with a long philosophical history in the West that often characterizes faith as rational.  This Western Philosophical tradition can be said to begin with Augustine and continue through to present times.

The New Atheists subscribe to some version or other of scientism as their criterion for rational belief.  According to scientism, empirical science is the only source of our knowledge of the world (strong scientism) or, more moderately, the best source of rational belief about the way things are (weak scientism). Harris and Dawkins are quite explicit about this. Harris equates a genuinely rational approach to spiritual and ethical questions with a scientific approach to these sorts of questions. Dawkins insists that the presence or absence of a creative super-intelligence is a scientific question. The New Atheists also affirm evidentialism, the claim that a belief can be epistemically justified only if it is based on adequate evidence. The conjunction of scientism and evidentialism entails that a belief can be justified only if it is based on adequate scientific evidence. The New Atheists’ conclusion that belief in God is unjustified follows, then, from their addition of the claim that there is inadequate scientific evidence for God’s existence (and even adequate scientific evidence for God’s non-existence).  Dawkins argues that the “God Hypothesis” the claim that there exists a superhuman, supernatural intelligence who deliberately designed and created the universe, is “founded on local traditions of private revelation rather than evidence” (2006, pp. 31-32). Given these New Atheist epistemological assumptions (and their consequences for religious epistemology), it is not surprising that some criticism of their views has included questions about whether there is adequate scientific support for scientism and whether there is adequate evidence for evidentialism.

2. Arguments For and Against God’s Existence

Since atheism continues to be a highly controversial philosophical position, one would expect that the New Atheists would devote a fair amount of space to a careful (and, of course, critical) consideration of arguments for God’s existence  and that they would also spend a corresponding amount of time formulating a case for the non-existence of God.  However, none of them addresses either theistic or atheistic arguments to any great extent. Dawkins does devote a chapter apiece to each of these tasks, but he has been criticized for engaging in an overly cursory evaluation of theistic arguments and for ignoring the philosophical literature in natural theology.   The literature overlooked by Dawkins addresses issues relevant to his claim that there almost certainly is no God. Harris, who thinks that atheism is obviously true, does not dedicate much space to a discussion of arguments for or against theism.  He does sketch a brief version of the cosmological argument for God’s existence but asserts that the final conclusion does not follow because the argument does not rule out alternative possibilities for the universe’s existence. Harris also hints at reasons to deny God’s existence by pointing to unexplained evil and “unintelligent design” in the world. Hitchens includes chapters entitled “The Metaphysical Claims of Religion are False” and “Arguments from Design,” but his more journalistic treatment of the cases for and against God’s existence amounts primarily to the claim that the God hypothesis is unnecessary since science can now explain what theism was formerly thought to be required to explain, including phenomena such as the appearance of design in the universe. After considering the standard arguments for God’s existence and rehearsing standard objections to them, Dennett argues that the concept of God is insufficiently determinate for it to be possible to know what proposition is at issue in the debate over God’s existence.

Dawkins’ argument for the probable non-existence of God is the most explicit and thorough attempt at an atheistic argument amongst the four. However, he does not state this argument in a deductively valid form, so it is difficult to discern exactly what he has in mind. Dawkins labels his argument for God’s non-existence “the Ultimate Boeing 747 gambit,” because he thinks that God’s existence is at least as improbable as the chance that a hurricane, sweeping through a scrap yard, would have the luck to assemble a Boeing 747 (an image that he borrows from Fred Hoyle, who used it for a different purpose). At the heart of his argument is the claim that any God capable of designing a universe must be a supremely complex and improbable entity who needs an even bigger explanation than the one the existence of such a God is supposed to provide. Dawkins also says that the hypothesis that an intelligent designer created the universe is self-defeating. What he appears to mean by this charge is that this intelligent design hypothesis claims to provide an ultimate explanation for all existing improbable complexity and yet cannot provide an explanation of its own improbable complexity. Dawkins further states that the God hypothesis creates a vicious regress rather than terminating one. Similarly, Harris follows Dawkins’ in arguing that the notion of a creator God leads to an infinite regress because such a being would have to have been created. Some critics, like William Lane Craig, reply that, at best, Dawkins’ argument could show only that the God hypothesis does not explain the appearance of design in the universe (a claim that Craig denies) but it does not demonstrate that God probably doesn’t exist. Dawkins’ assumption that God would need an extenal cause flies in the face of the longstanding theological assumption that God is a perfect and so necessary being who is consequently self-existent and ontologically independent. At the very least, Dawkins owes the defender of this classical conception of God further clarification of the kind of complexity he attributes to God and further arguments for the claims that God possesses this kind of complexity and that God’s being complex in this way is incompatible with God’s being self-existent. In reply to Dawkins, Craig argues that though the contents of God’s mind may be complex, God’s mind itself is simple.

3. Evolution and Religious Belief

The New Atheists observe that if there is no supernatural reality, then religion and religious belief must have a purely natural explanation. They agree that these sociological and psychological phenomena are rooted in biology. Harris summarizes their view by saying that as a biological phenomenon, religion is the product of cognitive processes that have deep roots in our evolutionary past. Dawkins endorses the general hypothesis that religion and religious belief are byproducts of something else that has survival value. His specific hypothesis is that human beings have acquired religious beliefs because there is a selective advantage to child brains that possess the rule of thumb to believe, without question, whatever familiar adults tell them. Dawkins speculates that this cognitive disposition, which tends to help inexperienced children to avoid harm, also tends to make them susceptible to acquiring their elders’ irrational and harmful religious beliefs. Dawkins is less committed to this specific hypothesis than he is to the general hypothesis, and he is open to other specific hypotheses of the same kind. Dennett discusses a number of these specific hypotheses more thoroughly in his attempt to “break the spell” he identifies as the taboo against a thorough scientific investigation of religion as one natural phenomenon among many.

At the foundation of Dennett’s “proto-theory” about the origin of religion and religious belief is his appeal to the evolution in humans (and other animals) of a “hyperactive agent detection device” (HADD), which is the disposition to attribute agency – beliefs and desires and other mental states – to anything complicated that moves. Dennett adds that when an event is sufficiently puzzling, our “weakness for certain sorts of memorable combos” cooperates with our HADD to constitute “a kind of fiction-generating contraption” that hypothesizes the existence of invisible and even supernatural agents (2006, pp. 119-120). Dennett goes on to engage in a relatively extensive speculation about how religion and religious belief evolved from these purely natural beginnings. Though Hitchens mentions Dennett’s naturalistic approach to religion in his chapter on “religion’s corrupt beginnings,” he focuses primarily on the interplay between a pervasive gullibility he takes to be characteristic of human beings and the exploitation of this credulity that he attributes to the founders of religions and religious movements. The scientific investigation of religion of the sort Dennett recommends has prompted a larger interdisciplinary conversation that includes both theists and non-theists with academic specialties in science, philosophy, and theology (see Schloss and Murray 2009 for an important example of this sort of collaboration).

4. The Moral Evaluation of Religion

The New Atheists agree that, although religion may have been a byproduct of certain human qualities that proved important for survival, religion itself is not necessarily a beneficial social and cultural phenomenon on balance at present. Indeed, three of the New Atheists (Harris, Dawkins, and Hitchens) are quite explicit in their moral condemnation of religious people on the ground that religious beliefs and practices have had significant and predominately negative consequences. The examples they provide of such objectionable behaviors range from the uncontroversial (suicide bombings, the Inquisition, “religious” wars, witch hunts, homophobia, etc.) to the controversial (prohibition of “victimless crimes” such as drug use and prostitution, criminalization of abortion and euthanasia,  "child abuse" due to identification of children as members of their parents religious communities, and so forth). Harris is explicit about placing the blame for these evils on faith, defined as unfounded belief. He argues that faith in what religious believers take to be God’s will as revealed in God’s book inevitably leads to immoral behaviors of these sorts. In this way, the New Atheists link their epistemological critique of religious belief with their moral criticism of religion.

The New Atheists counter the claim that religion makes people good by listing numerous examples of the preceding sort in which religion allegedly makes people bad. They also anticipate the reply that the moral consequences of atheism are worse than those of theism. A typical case for this claim appeals to the atrocities perpetrated by people like Hitler and Stalin. The New Atheists reply that Hitler was not necessarily an atheist because he claimed to be a Christian and that these regimes were evil because they were influenced by religion or were like a religion and that, even if their leaders were atheists (as in the case of Stalin), their crimes against humanity were not caused by their atheism because they were not carried out in the name of atheism. The New Atheists seem to be  agreed that theistic belief has generally worse attitudinal and behavioral moral consequences than atheistic belief. Dennett is characteristically more hesitant to draw firm conclusions along these lines until further empirical investigation is undertaken..

5. Secular Morality

These moral objections to religion presuppose a moral standard. Since the New Atheists have denied the existence of any supernatural reality, this moral standard has to have a purely natural and secular basis. Many non-theists have located the natural basis for morality in human convention, a move that leads naturally to ethical relativism. But the New Atheists either explicitly reject ethical relativism, or affirm the existence of the “transcendent value” of justice, or assert that there is a consensus about what we consider right and wrong, or simply engage in a moral critique of religion that implicitly presupposes a universal moral standard.

The New Atheists’ appeal to a universal secular moral standard raises some interesting philosophical questions. First, what is the content of morality? Harris comes closest to providing an explicit answer to that question in stating that questions of right and wrong are really questions about the happiness and suffering of sentient creatures. Second, if the content of morality is not made accessible to human beings by means of a revelation of God’s will, then how do humans know what the one moral standard is? The New Atheists seem to be agreed that we have foundational moral knowledge. Harris calls the source of this basic moral knowledge “moral intuition.” Since the other New Atheists don’t argue for the moral principles to which they appeal, it seems reasonable to conclude that they would agree with Harris. Third, what is the ontological ground of the universal moral standard? Given the assumption that ethical relativism is false, the question arises concerning what the objective natural ground is that makes it the case that some people are virtuous and some are not and that some behaviors are morally right and some are not. Again, Harris’s view that our ethical intuitions have their roots in biology is representative. Dawkins provides “four good Darwinian reasons” that purport to explain why some animals (including, of course human beings) engage in moral behavior. And though Dennett’s focus is on the evolution of religion, he is likely to have a similar story about the evolution of morality. One problem with this biological answer to our philosophical question is that it could only explain what causes moral behavior; it can’t also account for what makes moral principles true. The fourth philosophical question raised by the New Atheists is one they address themselves: “Why should we be moral?” Harris’s answer is that being moral tends to contribute to one’s happiness. Dawkins’ reply to the critic who asks, “If there’s no God, why be good?” seems to amount to no more than the observation that there are moral atheists. But this could only show that belief in God is not needed to motivate people to be moral; it doesn’t explain what does (or should) motivate atheists to be moral.

6. Alleged Divine Revelations

If there is no divine being, then there are no divine revelations. If there are no divine revelations, then every sacred book is a merely human book. Harris, Dawkins, and Hitchens each construct a case for the claim that no alleged written divine revelation could have a divine origin. Their arguments for this conclusion focus on what they take to be the moral deficiencies and factual errors of these books. Harris quotes passages from the part of the Old Testament traditionally labeled the “Law” that he considers barbaric and then asserts (on the basis of his view that Jesus can be read to endorse the entirety of Old Testament law) that the New Testament does not improve on these injunctions. He says that any subsequent more moderate Christian migration away from these biblical legal requirements is a result of taking scripture less and less seriously. Dawkins agrees with Harris that the God of the Bible and the Qur’an is not a moderate. As a matter of fact, he says that “The God of the Old Testament is arguably the most unpleasant character in all of fiction” (Dawkins 2006, p. 31). Though he says that “Jesus is a huge improvement over the cruel ogre of the Old Testament” (Dawkins 2006, p. 25), he argues that the doctrine of atonement, “which lies at the heart of New Testament theology, is almost as morally obnoxious as the story of Abraham setting out to barbecue Isaac” (Dawkins 2006, p. 251). Hitchens adds his own similar criticisms of both testaments in two chapters: “The Nightmare of the ‘Old’ Testament” and “The ‘New’ Testament Exceeds the Evil of the ‘Old’ One.” He also devotes a chapter to the Qur’an (as does Harris) and a section to the Book of Mormon. Dennett hints at a different objection to the Bible by remarking that anybody can quote the Bible to prove anything.

This collective case against the authenticity of any alleged written divine revelation raises interesting questions in philosophical theology about what kind of book could qualify as “God’s Word.” For instance, Harris considers it astonishing that a book as “ordinary” as the Bible is nonetheless thought to be a product of omniscience. He also says that, whereas the Bible contains no formal discussion of mathematics and some obvious mathematical errors, a book written by an omniscient being could contain a chapter on mathematics that would still be the richest source of mathematical insight humanity has ever known. This sort of claim invites further discussion about the sorts of purposes God would have and strategies God would employ in communicating with human beings in different times and places.

7. Secular Fulfillment

Each of the New Atheists recommends or at least alludes to a non-religious means of personal fulfillment and even collective well-being. Harris advocates a “spirituality” that involves meditation leading to happiness through an eradication of one’s sense of self. He thinks that scientific exploration into the nature of human consciousness will provide a progressively more adequate natural and rational basis for such a practice. For inspiration in a Godless world, Dawkins looks to the power of science to open the mind and satisfy the psyche. He celebrates the liberation of human beings from ignorance due to the growing and assumedly limitless capacity of science to explain the universe and everything in it. Hitchens hints at his own source of secular satisfaction by claiming that the natural is wondrous enough for anyone. He expresses his hope for a renewed Enlightenment focused on human beings, based on unrestricted scientific inquiry, and eventually productive of a new humane civilization. Dennett believes that a purely naturalistic spirituality is possible through a selfless attitude characterized by humble curiosity about the world’s complexities resulting in a realization of the relative unimportance of one’s personal preoccupations.

8. Criticism of the New Atheists

A number of essays and books have been written in response to the New Atheists (see the “References and Further Reading” section below for some titles). Some of these works are supportive of them and some of them are critical. Other works include both positive and negative evaluations of the New Atheism. Clearly, the range of philosophical issues raised by the New Atheists’ claims and arguments is broad. As might be expected, attention has been focused on their epistemological views, their metaphysical assumptions, and their axiological positions. Their presuppositions should prompt more discussion in the fields of philosophical theology, philosophy of science, philosophical hermeneutics, the relation between science and religion, and historiography. Conversations about the New Atheists’ stances and rationales have also taken place in the form of debates between Harris, Dawkins, Hitchens, and Dennett and defenders of religious belief and religion such as Dinesh D’Souza, who has published his own defense of Christianity in response to the New Atheists’ arguments. These debates are accessible in a number of places on the Internet. Finally, the challenges to religion posed by the New Atheists have also prompted a number of seminars and conferences. One of these is a conference presented by the Center for Philosophy of Religion at the University of Notre Dame, entitled, “My Ways Are Not Your Ways: The Character of the God of the Hebrew Bible” ( 2009). For an introduction to the sorts of issues this conference addresses, see Copan 2008.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Berlinski, David. The Devil’s Delusion: Atheism and its Scientific Pretensions (New York: Crown Forum, 2008).
    • A response to the New Atheists by a secular Jew that defends traditional religious thought.
  • Copan, Paul. “Is Yahweh a Moral Monster? The New Atheists and Old Testament Ethics,” Philosophia Christi 10:1, 2008, pp. 7-37.
    • A defense of the God and ethics of the Old Testament against the New Atheists’ criticisms of them.
  • Copan, Paul and William Lane Craig, eds. Contending with Christianity's Critics (Nashville, Tenn.: Broadman and Holman, 2009).
    • A collection of essays by Christian apologists that addresses challenges from New Atheists and other contemporary critics of Christianity.
  • Craig, William Lane, ed. God is Great, God is Good: Why Believing in God is Reasonable and Responsible (Grand Rapids: InterVarsity Press, 2009).
    • A collection of essays by philosophers and theologians defending the rationality of theistic belief from the attacks of the New Atheists and others.
  • Dawkins, Richard. The Selfish Gene, 2nd ed. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989).
    • An explanation and defense of biological evolution by natural selection that focuses on the gene.
  • Dawkins, Richard. The God Delusion (Boston: Houghton Mifflin, 2006).
    • A case for the irrationality and immoral consequences of religious belief that draws primarily on evolutionary biology.
  • Dennett, Daniel. Breaking the Spell: Religion as a Natural Phenomenon (New York: Penguin, 2006).
    • A case for studying the history and practice of religion by means of the natural sciences.
  • D’Souza, Dinesh. What’s So Great About Christianity (Carol Stream, IL: Tyndale House Publishers, 2007).
    • A defense of Christianity against the criticisms of the New Atheists.
  • Eagleton, Terry. Reason, Faith, and Revolution: Reflections on the God Debate (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2009).
    • A critical reply to Dawkins and Hitchens (“Ditchkins”) by a Marxist literary critic.
  • Flew, Antony. There is a God: How the World’s Most Notorious Atheist Changed His Mind (New York: HarperOne, 2007).
    • A former atheistic philosopher’s account of his conversion to theism (which includes a section by co-author Roy Abraham Varghese that provides a critical appraisal of the New Atheism).
  • Harris, Sam. The End of Faith: Religion, Terror, and the Future of Reason (New York: Norton, 2004).
    • An intellectual and moral critique of faith-based religions that recommends their replacement by science-based spirituality.
  • Harris, Sam. Letter to a Christian Nation (New York: Vintage Books, 2008).
    • A revised edition of his 2006 response to Christian reactions to his 2004 book.
  • Hitchens, Christopher. God is Not Great: How Religion Poisons Everything (New York: Twelve, 2007).
    • A journalistic case against religion and religious belief.
  • Keller, Timothy. The Reason for God: Belief in God in an Age of Skepticism (New York: Dutton, 2007).
    • A Christian minister’s reply to objections against Christianity of the sort raised by the New Atheists together with his positive case for Christianity.
  • Kurtz, Paul. Forbidden Fruit: The Ethics of Secularism (Amherst, New York: Prometheus Books, 2008).
    • A case for an atheistic secular humanistic ethics by a philosopher.
  • McGrath, Alister and Joanna Collicutt McGrath. The Dawkins Delusion? Atheist Fundamentalism and the Denial of the Divine (Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 2007).
    • A critical engagement with the arguments set out in Dawkins 2006.
  • Ray, Darrel W. The God Virus: How Religion Infects Our Lives and Culture (IPC Press, 2009).
    • A book by an organizational psychologist that purports to explain how religion has negative consequences for both individuals and societies.
  • Schloss, Jeffrey and Michael Murray, eds. The Believing Primate: Scientific, Philosophical, and Theological Reflections on the Origin of Religion (New York: Oxford University Press, 2009).
    • An interdisciplinary discussion of issues raised by the sort of naturalistic account of religion promoted in Dennett 2006 and elsewhere.
  • Stenger, Victor. God: The Failed Hypothesis. How Science Shows That God Does Not Exist (Prometheus Books, 2008).
    • A scientific case for the non-existence of God by a physicist.
  • Stenger, Victor. The New Atheism: Taking a Stand for Science and Reason (Prometheus Books, 2009).
    • A defense of the New Atheism by a physicist.
  • Ward, Keith. Is Religion Dangerous? (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 2006).
    • A defense of religion against the New Atheists’ arguments by a philosopher-theologian.

Author Information

James E. Taylor
Westmont College
U. S. A.


The term “atheist” describes a person who does not believe that God or a divine being exists.  Worldwide there may be as many as a billion atheists, although social stigma, political pressure, and intolerance make accurate polling difficult.

For the most part, atheists have presumed that the most reasonable conclusions are the ones that have the best evidential support.  And they have argued that the evidence in favor of God’s existence is too weak, or the arguments in favor of concluding there is no God are more compelling.  Traditionally the arguments for God’s existence have fallen into several families: ontological, teleological, and cosmological arguments, miracles, and prudential justifications.  For detailed discussion of those arguments and the major challenges to them that have motivated the atheist conclusion, the reader is encouraged to consult the other relevant sections of the encyclopedia.

Arguments for the non-existence of God are deductive or inductive.  Deductive arguments for the non-existence of God are either single or multiple property disproofs that allege that there are logical or conceptual problems with one or several properties that are essential to any being worthy of the title “God.”  Inductive arguments typically present empirical evidence that is employed to argue that God’s existence is improbable or unreasonable.  Briefly stated, the main arguments are:  God’s non-existence is analogous to the non-existence of Santa Claus.  The existence of widespread human and non-human suffering is incompatible with an all powerful, all knowing, all good being.  Discoveries about the origins and nature of the universe, and about the evolution of life on Earth make the God hypothesis an unlikely explanation.  Widespread non-belief and the lack of compelling evidence show that a God who seeks belief in humans does not exist.  Broad considerations from science that support naturalism, or the view that all and only physical entities and causes exist, have also led many to the atheism conclusion.

The presentation below provides an overview of concepts, arguments, and issues that are central to work on atheism.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Atheism?
  2. The Epistemology of Atheism
  3. Deductive Atheology
    1. Single Property Disproofs
    2. Multiple Property Disproofs
    3. Failure of Proof Disproof
  4. Inductive Atheology
    1. The Prospects for Inductive Proof
    2. The Santa Claus Argument
    3. Problem of Evil
    4. Cosmology
    5. Teleological Arguments
    6. Arguments from Nonbelief
    7. Atheistic Naturalism
  5. Cognitivism and Non-Cognitivism
  6. Future Prospects for Atheism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. What is Atheism?

Atheism is the view that there is no God.  Unless otherwise noted, this article will use the term “God” to describe the divine entity that is a central tenet of the major monotheistic religious traditions--Christianity, Islam, and Judaism.  At a minimum, this being is usually understood as having all power, all knowledge, and being infinitely good or morally perfect.  See the article Western Concepts of God for more details.  When necessary, we will use the term “gods” to describe all other lesser or different  characterizations of divine beings, that is, beings that lack some, one, or all of the omni- traits.

There have been many thinkers in history who have lacked a belief in God.  Some ancient Greek philosophers, such as Epicurus, sought natural explanations for natural phenomena. Epicurus was also to first to question the compatibility of God with suffering.  Forms of philosophical naturalism that would replace all supernatural explanations with natural ones also extend into ancient history.  During the Enlightenment,  David Hume and Immanuel Kant give influential critiques of the traditional arguments for the existence of God in the 18th century.  After Darwin (1809-1882) makes the case for evolution and some modern advancements in science, a fully articulated philosophical worldview that denies the existence of God gains traction.  In the 19th and 20th centuries, influential critiques on God, belief in God, and Christianity by Nietzsche, Feuerbach, Marx, Freud, and Camus set the stage for modern atheism.

It has come to be widely accepted that to be an atheist is to affirm the non-existence of God.  Anthony Flew (1984) called this positive atheism, whereas to lack a belief that God or gods exist is to be a negative atheist. Parallels for this use of the term would be terms such as “amoral,” “atypical,” or “asymmetrical.”  So negative atheism would includes someone who has never reflected on the question of whether or not God exists and has no opinion about the matter and someone who had thought about the matter a great deal and has concluded either that she has insufficient evidence to decide the question, or that the question cannot be resolved in principle.  Agnosticism is traditionally characterized as neither believing that God exists nor believing that God does not exist.

Atheism can be narrow or wide in scope.  The narrow atheist does not believe in the existence of God (an omni- being).  A wide atheist does not believe that any gods exist, including but not limited to the traditional omni-God.  The wide positive atheist denies that God exists, and also denies that Zeus, Gefjun, Thor, Sobek, Bakunawa and others exist.  The narrow atheist does not believe that God exists, but need not take a stronger view about the existence or non-existence of other supernatural beings.  One could be a narrow atheist about God, but still believe in the existence of some other supernatural entities.  (This is one of the reasons that it is a mistake to identify atheism with materialism or naturalism.)

Separating these different senses of the term allows us to better understand the different sorts of justification that can be given for varieties of atheism with different scopes.  An argument may serve to justify one form of atheism and not another.  For Instance, alleged contradictions within a Christian conception of God by themselves do not serve as evidence for wide atheism, but presumably, reasons that are adequate to show that there is no omni-God would be sufficient to show that there is no Islamic God.

2. The Epistemology of Atheism

We can divide the justifications for atheism into several categories.  For the most part, atheists have taken an evidentialist approach to the question of God’s existence.  That is, atheists have taken the view that whether or not a person is justified in having an attitude of belief towards the proposition, “God exists,” is a function of that person’s evidence.  “Evidence” here is understood broadly to include a priori arguments, arguments to the best explanation, inductive and empirical reasons, as well as deductive and conceptual premises.  An asymmetry exists between theism and atheism in that atheists have not offered faith as a justification for non-belief.  That is, atheists have not presented non-evidentialist defenses for believing that there is no God.

Not all theists appeal only to faith, however.  Evidentialists theist and evidentialist atheists may have a number of general epistemological principles concerning evidence, arguments, and implication in common, but then disagree about what the evidence is, how it should be understood, and what it implies.  They may disagree, for instance, about whether the values of the physical constants and laws in nature constitute evidence for intentional fine tuning, but agree at least that whether God exists is a matter that can be explored empirically or with reason.

Many non-evidentialist theists may deny that the acceptability of particular religious claim depends upon evidence, reasons, or arguments as they have been classically understood.  Faith or prudential based beliefs in God, for example, will fall into this category.  The evidentialist atheist and the non-evidentialist theist, therefore, may have a number of more fundamental disagreements about the acceptability of believing, despite inadequate or contrary evidence, the epistemological status of prudential grounds for believing, or the nature of God belief.  Their disagreement may not be so much about the evidence, or even about God, but about the legitimate roles that evidence, reason, and faith should play in human belief structures.

It is not clear that arguments against atheism that appeal to faith have any prescriptive force the way appeals to evidence do.  The general evidentialist view is that when a person grasps that an argument is sound that imposes an epistemic obligation on her to accept the conclusion.  Insofar as having faith that a claim is true amounts to believing contrary to or despite a lack of evidence, one person’s faith that God exists does not have this sort of inter-subjective, epistemological implication.  Failing to believe what is clearly supported by the evidence is ordinarily irrational.  Failure to have faith that some claim is true is not similarly culpable.

Justifying atheism, then, can entail several different projects.  There are the evidential disputes over what information we have available to us, how it should be interpreted, and what it implies.  There are also broader meta-epistemological concerns about the roles of argument, reasoning, belief, and religiousness in human life.  The atheist can find herself not just arguing that the evidence indicates that there is no God, but defending science, the role of reason, and the necessity of basing beliefs on evidence more generally.

Friendly atheism; William Rowe has introduced an important distinction to modern discussions of atheism. If someone has arrived at what they take to be a reasonable and well-justified conclusion that there is no God, then what attitude should she take about another person’s persistence in believing in God, particularly when that other person appears to be thoughtful and at least prima facie reasonable?  It seems that the atheist could take one of several views.  The theist’s belief, as the atheist sees it, could be rational or irrational, justified or unjustified.  Must the atheist who believes that the evidence indicates that there is no God conclude that the theist’s believing in God is irrational or unjustified?  Rowe’s answer is no.  (Rowe 1979, 2006)

Rowe and most modern epistemologists have said that whether a conclusion C is justified for a person  S will be a function of the information (correct or incorrect) that S possesses and the principles of inference that S employs in arriving at C.  But whether or not C is justified is not directly tied to its truth, or even to the truth of the evidence concerning C.  That is, a person can have a justified, but false belief.  She could arrive at a conclusion through an epistemically inculpable process and yet get it wrong.  Ptolemy, for example, the greatest astronomer of his day, who had mastered all of the available information and conducted exhaustive research into the question, was justified in concluding that the Sun orbits the Earth.  A medieval physician in the 1200s who guesses (correctly) that the bubonic plague was caused by the bacterium yersinia pestis would not have been reasonable or justified given his background information and given that the bacterium would not even be discovered for 600 years.

We can call the view that rational, justified beliefs can be false, as it applies to atheism, friendly or fallibilist atheism.  See the article on Fallibilism. The friendly atheist can grant that a theist may be justified or reasonable in believing in God, even though the atheist takes the theist’s conclusion to be false.  What could explain their divergence to the atheist?  The believer may not be in possession of all of the relevant information.  The believer may be basing her conclusion on a false premise or premises.  The believer may be implicitly or explicitly employing inference rules that themselves are not reliable or truth preserving, but the background information she has leads her, reasonably, to trust the inference rule.  The same points can be made for the friendly theist and the view that he may take about the reasonableness of the atheist’s conclusion.  It is also possible, of course, for both sides to be unfriendly and conclude that anyone who disagrees with what they take to be justified is being irrational.  Given developments in modern epistemology and Rowe’s argument, however, the unfriendly view is neither correct nor conducive to a constructive and informed analysis of the question of God.

Atheists have offered a wide range of justifications and accounts for non-belief.  A notable modern view is Antony Flew’s Presumption of Atheism (1984). Flew argues that the default position for any rational believer should be neutral with regard to the existence of God and to be neutral is to not have a belief regarding its existence.  And not having a belief with regard to God is to be a negative atheist on Flew’s account. "The onus of proof lies on the man who affirms, not on the man who denies. . . on the proposition, not on the opposition,” Flew argues (20).  Beyond that, coming to believe that such a thing does or does not exist will require justification, much as a jury presumes innocence concerning the accused and requires evidence in order to conclude that he is guilty.  Flew’s negative atheist will presume nothing at the outset, not even the logical coherence of the notion of God, but her presumption will be defeasible, or revisable in the light of evidence.  We shall call this view atheism by default.

The atheism by default position contrasts with a more permissive attitude that is sometimes taken regarding religious belief.  The notions of religious tolerance and freedom are sometimes understood to indicate the epistemic permissibility of believing despite a lack of evidence in favor or even despite evidence to the contrary.  One is in violation of no epistemic duty by believing, even if one lacks conclusive evidence in favor or even if one has evidence that is on the whole against.  In contrast to Flew’s jury model, we can think of this view as treating religious beliefs as permissible until proven incorrect.  Some aspects of fideistic accounts or Plantinga’s reformed epistemology can be understood in this light.  This sort of epistemic policy about God or any other matter has been controversial, and a major point of contention between atheists and theists.  Atheists have argued that we typically do not take it to be epistemically inculpable or reasonable for a person to believe in Santa Claus, the Tooth Fairy, or some other supernatural being merely because they do not possess evidence to the contrary.  Nor would we consider it reasonable for a person to begin believing that they have cancer because they do not have proof to the contrary.  The atheist by default argues that it would be appropriate to not believe in such circumstances.  The epistemic policy here takes its inspiration from an influential piece by W.K. Clifford (1999) in which he argues that it is wrong, always, everywhere, and for anyone, to believe anything for which there is insufficient reason.

There are several other approaches to the justification of atheism that we will consider below.  There is a family of arguments, sometimes known as exercises in deductive atheology, for the conclusion that the existence of God is impossible.  Another large group of important and influential arguments can be gathered under the heading inductive atheology.  These probabilistic arguments invoke considerations about the natural world such as widespread suffering, nonbelief, or findings from biology or cosmology.  Another approach, atheistic noncognitivism, denies that God talk is even meaningful or has any propositional content that can be evaluated in terms of truth or falsity. Rather, religious speech acts are better viewed as a complicated sort of emoting or expression of spiritual passion.  Inductive and deductive approaches are cognitivistic in that they accept that claims about God have meaningful content and can be determined to be true or false.

3. Deductive Atheology

Many discussions about the nature and existence of God have either implicitly or explicitly accepted that the concept of God is logically coherent.  That is, for many believers and non-believers the assumption has been that such a being as God could possibly exist but they have disagreed about whether there actually is one.  Atheists within the deductive atheology tradition, however, have not even granted that God, as he is typically described, is possible.  The first question we should ask, argues the deductive atheist, is whether the description or the concept is logically consistent.  If it is not, then no such being could possibly exist.  The deductive atheist argues that some, one, or all of God’s essential properties are logically contradictory.  Since logical impossibilities are not and cannot be real, God does not and cannot exist.  Consider a putative description of an object as a four-sided triangle, a married bachelor, or prime number with more than 2 factors.  We can be certain that no such thing fitting that description exists because what they describe is demonstrably impossible.

If deductive atheological proofs are successful, the results will be epistemically significant.  Many people have doubts that the view that there is no God can be rationally justified.  But if deductive disproofs show that there can exist no being with a certain property or properties and those properties figure essentially in the characterization of God, then we will have the strongest possible justification for concluding that there is no being fitting any of those characterizations.  If God is impossible, then God does not exist.

It may be possible at this point to re-engineer the description of God so that it avoids the difficulties, but now the theist faces several challenges according to the deductive atheologist.  First, if the traditional description of God is logically incoherent, then what is the relationship between a theist’s belief and some revised, more sophisticated account that allegedly does not suffer from those problems? Is that the God that she believed in all along?  Before the account of God was improved by consideration of the atheological arguments, what were the reasons that led her to believe in that conception of God?  Secondly, if the classical characterizations of God are shown to be logically impossible, then there is a legitimate question as whether any new description that avoids those problems describes a being that is worthy of the label.  It will not do, in the eyes of many theists and atheists, to retreat to the view that God is merely a somewhat powerful, partially-knowing, and partly-good being, for example.  Thirdly, the atheist will still want to know on the basis of what evidence or arguments should we conclude that a being as described by this modified account exists?  Fourthly, there is no question that there exist less than omni-beings in the world.  We possess less than infinite power, knowledge and goodness, as do many other creatures and objects in our experience.  What is the philosophical importance or metaphysical significance of arguing for the existence of those sorts of beings and advocating belief in them?  Fifthly, and most importantly, if it has been argued that God’s essential properties are impossible, then any move to another description seems to be a concession that positive atheism about God is justified.

Another possible response that the theist may take in response to deductive atheological arguments is to assert that God is something beyond proper description with any of the concepts or properties that we can or do employ as suggested in Kierkegaard or Tillich.  So complications from incompatibilities among properties of God indicate problems for our descriptions, not the impossibility of a divine being worthy of the label. Many atheists have not been satisfied with this response.  The theist has now asserted the existence of and attempted to argue in favor of believing in a being that we cannot form a proper idea of, one that does not have  properties that we can acknowledge; it is a being that defies comprehension.  It is not clear how we could have reasons or justifications for believing in the existence of such a thing.  It is not clear how it could be an existing thing in any familiar sense of the term in that it lacks comprehensible properties.  Or put another way, as Patrick Grim notes, “If a believer’s notion of God remains so vague as to escape all impossibility arguments, it can be argued, it cannot be clear to even him what he believes—or whether what he takes for pious belief has any content at all,” (2007, p. 200).  It is not clear how it could be reasonable to believe in such a thing, and it is even more doubtful that it is epistemically unjustified or irresponsible to deny that such a thing is exists.  It is clear, however, that the deductive atheologist must acknowledge the growth and development of our concepts and descriptions of reality over time, and she must take a reasonable view about the relationship of those attempts and revisions in our ideas about what may turns out to be real.

a. Single Property Disproofs

Deductive disproofs have typically focused on logical inconsistencies to be found either within a single property or between multiple properties.  Philosophers have struggled to work out the details of what it would be to be omnipotent, for instance.  It has come to be widely accepted that a being cannot be omnipotent where omnipotence simply means to power to do anything including the logically impossible.  This definition of the term suffers from the stone paradox.  An omnipotent being would either be capable of creating a rock that he cannot lift, or he is incapable.  If he is incapable, then there is something he cannot do, and therefore he does not have the power to do anything.  If he can create such a rock, then again there is something that he cannot do, namely lift the rock he just created.  So paradoxically, having the ability to do anything would appear to entail being unable to do some things.  As a result, many theists and atheists have agreed that a being could not have that property.  A number of attempts to work out an account of omnipotence have ensued.  (Cowan 2003, Flint and Freddoso 1983, Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1988 and 2006, Mavrodes 1977, Ramsey 1956, Sobel 2004, Savage 1967, and Wierenga 1989 for examples).  It has also been argued that omniscience is impossible, and that the most knowledge that can possibly be had is not enough to be fitting of God.  One of the central problems has been that God cannot have knowledge of indexical claims such as, “I am here now.”  It has also been argued that God can’t know future free choices, or God cannot know future contingent propositions, or that Cantor’s and Gödel proofs imply that the notion of a set of all truths cannot be made coherent.  (Everitt 2004, Grim 1985, 1988, 1984, Pucetti 1963, and Sobel 2004).  See the article on Omniscience and Divine Foreknowledge for more details.

The logical coherence of eternality, personhood, moral perfection, causal agency, and many others have been challenged in the deductive atheology literature.

b. Multiple Property Disproofs

Another form of deductive atheological argument attempts to show the logical incompatibility of two or more properties that God is thought to possess.  A long list of properties have been the subject of multiple property disproofs, transcendence and personhood, justice and mercy, immutability and omniscience, immutability and omnibenevolence, omnipresence and agency, perfection and love, eternality and omniscience, eternality and creator of the universe, omnipresence and consciousness.   (Blumenfeld 2003, Drange 1998b, Flew 1955, Grim 2007, Kretzmann 1966, and McCormick 2000 and 2003)

The combination of omnipotence and omniscience have received a great deal of attention.  To possess all knowledge, for instance, would include knowing all of the particular ways in which one will exercise one’s power, or all of the decisions that one will make, or all of the decisions that one has made in the past.  But knowing any of those entails that the known proposition is true.  So does God have the power to act in some fashion that he has not foreseen, or differently than he already has without compromising his omniscience?  It has also been argued that God cannot be both unsurpassably good and free.  (Rowe 2004).

c. Failure of Proof Disproof

When attempts to provide evidence or arguments in favor of the existence of something fail, a legitimate and important question is whether anything except the failure of those arguments can be inferred.  That is, does positive atheism follow from the failure of arguments for theism?  A number of authors have concluded that it does.  They taken the view that unless some case for the existence of God succeeds, we should believe that there is no God.

Many have taken an argument J.M. Findlay (1948) to be pivotal.  Findlay, like many others, argues that in order to be worthy of the label “God,” and in order to be worthy of a worshipful attitude of reverence, emulation, and abandoned admiration, the being that is the object of that attitude must be inescapable, necessary, and unsurpassably supreme.  (Martin 1990, Sobel 2004).  If a being like God were to exist, his existence would be necessary.  And his existence would be manifest as an a priori, conceptual truth.  That is to say that of all the approaches to God’s existence, the ontological argument is the strategy that we would expect to be successful were there a God, and if they do not succeed, then we can conclude that there is no God, Findlay argues. As most see it these attempts to prove God have not met with success, Findlay says, “The general philosophical verdict is that none of these 'proofs' is truly compelling.”

4. Inductive Atheology

a. The Prospects for Inductive Proof

The view that there is no God or gods has been criticized on the grounds that it is not possible to prove a negative.  No matter how exhaustive and careful our analysis, there could always be some proof, some piece of evidence, or some consideration that we have not considered.  God could be something that we have not conceived, or God exists in some form or fashion that has escaped our investigation.  Positive atheism draws a stronger conclusion than any of the problems with arguments for God’s existence alone could justify.  Absence of evidence is not evidence of absence.

Findlay and the deductive atheological arguments attempt to address these concerns, but a central question put to atheists has been about the possibility of giving inductive or probabilistic justifications for negative existential claims  The response to the, “You cannot prove a negative” criticism has been that it invokes an artificially high epistemological standard of justification that creates a much broader set of problems not confined to atheism.

The general principle seems to be that one is not epistemically entitled to believe a proposition unless you have exhausted all of the possibilities and proven beyond any doubt that a claim is true.  Or put negatively, one is not justified in disbelieving unless you have proven with absolute certainty that the thing in question does not exist.  The problem is that we do not have a priori disproof that many things do not exist, yet it is reasonable and justified to believe that they do not:  the Dodo bird is extinct, unicorns are not real, there is no teapot orbiting the Earth on the opposite side of the Sun, there is no Santa Claus, ghosts are not real, a defendant is not guilty, a patient does not have a particular disease, so on.  There are a wide range of other circumstances under which we take it that believing that X does not exist is reasonable even though no logical impossibility is manifest. None of these achieve the level of deductive, a priori or conceptual proof.

The objection to inductive atheism undermines itself in that it generates a broad, pernicious skepticism against far more than religious or irreligious beliefs.  Mackie (1982) says, “It will not be sufficient to criticize each argument on its own by saying that it does not prove the intended conclusion, that is, does not put it beyond all doubt.  That follows at once from the admission that the argument is non-deductive, and it is absurd to try to confine our knowledge and belief to matters which are conclusively established by sound deductive arguments.  The demand for certainty will inevitably be disappointed, leaving skepticism in command of almost every issue.”  (p. 7)  If the atheist is unjustified for lacking deductive proof, then it is argued, it would appear that so are the beliefs that planes fly, fish swim, or that there exists a mind-independent world.

The atheist can also wonder what the point of the objection is.  When we lack deductive disproof that X exists, should we be agnostic about it?  Is it permissible to believe that it does exist?  Clearly, that would not be appropriate.  Gravity may be the work of invisible, undetectable elves with sticky shoes.  We don’t have any certain disproof of the elves—physicists are still struggling with an explanation of gravity.  But surely someone who accepts the sticky-shoed elves view until they have deductive disproof is being unreasonable.  It is also clear that if you are a positive atheist about the gravity elves, you would not be unreasonable.  You would not be overstepping your epistemic entitlement by believing that no such things exist.  On the contrary, believing that they exist or even being agnostic about their existence on the basis of their mere possibility would not be justified.  So there appear to be a number of precedents and epistemic principles at work in our belief structures that provide room for inductive atheism.  However, these issues in the epistemology of atheism and recent work by Graham Oppy (2006) suggest that more attention must be paid to the principles that describe epistemic  permissibility, culpability, reasonableness, and justification with regard to the theist, atheist, and agnostic categories.

Below we will consider several groups of influential inductive atheological arguments .

b. The Santa Claus Argument

Martin (1990) offers this general principle to describe the criteria that render the belief, “X does not exist” justified:

A person is justified in believing that X does not exist if

(1)  all the available evidence used to support the view that X exists is shown to be inadequate; and

(2)  X is the sort of entity that, if X exists, then there is a presumption that would be evidence adequate to support the view that X exists; and

(3)  this presumption has not been defeated although serious efforts have been made to do so; and

(4)  the area where evidence would appear, if there were any, has been comprehensively examined; and

(5)  there are no acceptable beneficial reasons to believe that X exists.  (p. 283)

Many of the major works in philosophical atheism that address the full range of recent arguments for God’s existence (Gale 1991, Mackie 1982, Martin 1990, Sobel 2004, Everitt 2004, and Weisberger 1999) can be seen as providing evidence to satisfy the first,  fourth and fifth conditions.  A substantial body of articles with narrower scope (see References and Further Reading) can also be understood to play this role in justifying atheism.  A large group of discussions of Pascal’s Wager and related prudential justifications in the literature can also be seen as relevant to the satisfaction of the fifth condition.

One of the interesting and important questions in the epistemology of philosophy of religion has been whether the second and third conditions are satisfied concerning God.  If there were a God, how and in what ways would we expect him to show in the world?  Empirically?  Conceptually?  Would he be hidden?  Martin argues, and many others have accepted implicitly or explicitly, that God is the sort of thing that would manifest in some discernible fashion to our inquiries.   Martin concludes, therefore, that God satisfied all of the conditions, so, positive narrow atheism is justified.

c. Problem of Evil

The existence of widespread human and non-human animal suffering has been seen by many to be compelling evidence that a being with all power, all knowledge, and all goodness does not exist.  Many of those arguments have been deductive:  See the article on The Logical Problem of Evil. More recently, several inductive arguments from evil for the non-existence of God have received a great deal of attention.  See The Evidential Problem of Evil.

d. Cosmology

Questions about the origins of the universe and cosmology have been the focus for many inductive atheism arguments.  We can distinguish four recent views about God and the cosmos:

Naturalism: On naturalistic view, the Big Bang occurred approximately 13.7 billion years ago, the Earth formed out of cosmic matter about 4.6 billion years ago, and life forms on Earth, unaided by any supernatural forces about 4 billion years ago.  Various physical (non-God) hypotheses are currently being explored about the cause or explanation of the Big Bang such as the Hartle-Hawking no-boundary condition model, brane cosmology models, string theoretic models, ekpyrotic models, cyclic models, chaotic inflation, and so on.

Big Bang Theism: We can call the view that God caused about the Big Bang 13.7 billion years ago Big Bang Theism.

Intelligent Design Theism: There are many variations, but most often the view is that God created the universe, perhaps with the Big Bang 13.7 billion years ago, and then beginning with the appearance of life 4 billion years ago.  God supernaturally guided the formation and development of life into the forms we see today.

Creationism: Finally, there is a group of people who for the most part denies the occurrence of the Big Bang and of evolution altogether; God created the universe, the Earth, and all of the life on Earth in its more or less present form 6,000-10,000 years ago.

atheism graphic

Taking a broad view, many atheists have concluded that neither Big Bang Theism, Intelligent Design Theism, nor Creationism is the most reasonable description of the history of the universe.  Before the theory of evolution and recent developments in modern astronomy, a view wherein God did not play a large role in the creation and unfolding of the cosmos would have been hard to justify.  Now, internal problems with those views and the evidence from cosmology and biology indicate that naturalism is the best explanation.  Justifications for Big Bang Theism have focused on modern versions of the Cosmological and Kalam arguments.  Since everything that comes into being must have a cause, including the universe, then God was the cause of the Big Bang. (Craig 1995)

The objections to these arguments have been numerous and vigorously argued.  Critics have challenged the inference to a supernatural cause to fill gaps in the natural account, as well as the inferences that the first cause must be a single, personal, all-powerful, all-knowing, and all-good being.  It is not clear that any of the properties of God as classically conceived in orthodox monotheism can be inferred from what we know about the Big Bang without first accepting a number of theistic assumptions.  Infinite power and knowledge do not appear to be required to bring about a Big Bang—what if our Big Bang was the only act that a being could perform?  There appears to be consensus that infinite goodness or moral perfection cannot be inferred as a necessary part of the cause of the Big Bang—theists have focused their efforts in the problem of evil, discussions just attempting to prove that it is possible that God is infinitely good given the state of the world.  Big Bang Theism would need to show that no other sort of cause besides a morally perfect one could explain the universe we find ourselves in.  Critics have also doubted whether we can know that some supernatural force that caused the Big Bang is still in existence now or is the same entity as identified and worshipped in any particular religious tradition.  Even if major concessions are granted in the cosmological argument, all that it would seem to suggest is that there was a first cause or causes, but widely accepted arguments from that first cause or causes to the fully articulated God of Christianity or Islam, for instance, have not been forthcoming.

In some cases, atheists have taken the argument a step further.  They have offered cosmological arguments for the nonexistence of God on the basis of considerations from physics, astronomy, and subatomic theory.  These arguments are quite technical, so these remarks will be cursory.  God, if he exists, knowing all and having all power, would only employ those means to his ends that are rational, effective, efficient, and optimal.  If God were the creator, then he was the cause of the Big Bang, but cosmological atheists have argued that the singularity that produced the Big Bang and events that unfold thereafter preclude a rational divine agent from achieving particular ends with the Big Bang as the means.  The Big Bang would not have been the route God would have chosen to this world as a result.  (Stenger 2007, Smith 1993, Everitt 2004.)

e. Teleological Arguments

In William Paley’s famous analysis, he argues by analogy that the presence of order in the universe, like the features we find in a watch, are indicative of the existence of a designer who is responsible for the artifact.  Many authors—David Hume (1935), Wesley Salmon (1978), Michael Martin (1990)—have argued that a better case can be made for the nonexistence of God from the evidence.

Salmon, giving a modern Bayesian version of an argument that begins with Hume, argues that the likelihood that the ordered universe was created by intelligence is very low.  In general, instances of biologically or mechanically caused generation without intelligence are far more common than instances of creation from intelligence.  Furthermore, the probability that something that is generated by a biological or mechanical cause will exhibit order is quite high.  Among those things that are designed, the probability that they exhibit order may be quite high, but that is not the same as asserting that among the things that exhibit order the probability that they were designed is high.  Among dogs, the incidence of fur may be high, but it is not true that among furred things the incidence of dogs is high.  Furthermore, intelligent design and careful planning very frequently produces disorder—war, industrial pollution, insecticides, and so on.

So we can conclude that the probability that an unspecified entity (like the universe), which came into being and exhibits order, was produced by intelligent design is very low and that the empirical evidence indicates that there was no designer.

See the article on Design Arguments for the Existence of God for more details about the history of the argument and standard objections that have motivated atheism.

f. Arguments from Nonbelief

Another recent group of inductive atheistic arguments has focused on widespread nonbelief itself as evidence that atheism is justified.  The common thread in these arguments is that something as significant in the universe as God could hardly be overlooked.  The ultimate creator of the universe and a being with infinite knowledge, power, and love would not escape our attention, particularly since humans have devoted such staggering amounts of energy to the question for so many centuries.   Perhaps more importantly, a being such as God, if he chose, could certainly make his existence manifest to us.  Creating a state of affairs where his existence would be obvious, justified, or reasonable to us, or at least more obvious to more of us than it is currently, would be a trivial matter for an all-powerful being. So since our efforts have not yielded what we would expect to find if there were a God, then the most plausible explanation is that there is no God.

One might argue that we should not assume that God’s existence would be evident to us.  There may be reasons, some of which we can describe, others that we do not understand, that God could have for remaining out of sight.   Revealing himself is not something he desires, remaining hidden enables people to freely love, trust and obey him, remaining hidden prevents humans from reacting from improper motives, like fear of punishment, remaining hidden preserves human freewill.

The non-belief atheist has not found these speculations convincing for several reasons.  In religious history, God’s revealing himself to Moses, Muhammad, Jesus’ disciples, and even Satan himself did not compromise their cognitive freedom in any significant way.  Furthermore, attempts to explain why a universe where God exists would look just as we would expect a universe with no God have seemed ad hoc.  Some of the logical positivists’ and non-cognitivists’ concerns surface here.  If the believer maintains that a universe inhabited by God will look exactly like one without, then we must wonder what sort of counter-evidence would be allowed, even in principle, against the theist’s claim.  If no state of affairs could be construed as evidence against God’s existence, then what does the claim, “God exists,” mean and what are its real implications?

Alternately, how can it be unreasonable to not believe in the existence of something that defies all of our attempts to corroborate or discover?

Theodore Drange (2006)  has developed an argument that if God were the sort of being that wanted humans to come to believe that he exists, then he could bring it about that far more of them would believe than currently do.  God would be able, he would want humans to believe, there is nothing that he would want more, and God would not be irrational.  So God would bring it about that people would believe.  In general, he could have brought it about that the evidence that people have is far more convincing than what they have.  He could have miraculously appeared to everyone in a fashion that was far more compelling than the miracles stories that we have.  It is not the case that all, nearly all, or even a majority of people believe, so there must not be a God of that sort.

J.L. Schellenberg (1993) has developed an argument based upon a number of considerations that lead us to think that if there were a loving God, then we would expect to find some manifestations of him in the world.  If God is all powerful, then there would be nothing restraining him from making his presence known.  And if he is omniscient, then surely he would know how to reveal himself.  Perhaps, most importantly, if God is good and if God possesses an unsurpassable love for us, then God would consider each human’s requests as important and seek to respond quickly.  He would wish to spare those that he loves needless trauma.  He would not want to give those that he loves false or misleading thoughts about his relationship to them.  He would want as much personal interaction with them as possible, but of course, these conditions are not satisfied.  So it is strongly indicated that there is no such God.

Schellenberg gives this telling parable:

“You’re still a small child, and an amnesiac, but this time you’re in the middle of a vast rain forest, dripping with dangers of various kinds.  You’ve been stuck there for days, trying to figure out who you are and where you came from.  You don’t remember having a mother who accompanied you into this jungle, but in your moments of deepest pain and misery you call for her anyway, ‘Mooooommmmmmm!’  Over and over again.  For days and days … the last time when a jaguar comes at you out of nowhere … but with no response.  What should you think in this situation?  In your dying moments, what should cross your mind?  Would the thought that you have a mother who cares about you and hears your cry and could come to you but chooses not to even make it onto the list?” (2006, p. 31)

Like Drange, Schellenberg argues that there are many people who are epistemically inculpable in believing that there is no God.  That is, many people have carefully considered the evidence available to them, and have actively sought out more in order to determine what is reasonable concerning God.  They have fulfilled all relevant epistemic duties they might have in their inquiry into the question and they have arrived at a justified belief that there is no God.  If there were a God, however, evidence sufficient to form a reasonable belief in his existence would be available. So the occurrence of widespread epistemically inculpable nonbelief itself shows that there is no God.

g. Atheistic Naturalism

The final family of inductive arguments we will consider involves drawing a positive atheistic conclusion from broad, naturalized grounds.  See the article on Naturalism for background about the position and relevant arguments.  Comments here will be confined to naturalism as it relates to atheism.

Methodological naturalism can be understood as the view that the best or the only way to acquire knowledge within science is by adopting the assumption that all physical phenomena have physical causes.  This presumption by itself does not commit one to the view that only physical entities and causes exist, or that all knowledge must be acquired through scientific methods.  Methodological naturalism, therefore, is typically not seen as being in direct conflict with theism or having any particular implications for the existence or non-existence of God.

Ontological naturalism, however, is usually seen as taking a stronger view about the existence of God.  Ontological naturalism is the additional view that all and only physical entities and causes exist.

Among its theistic critics, there has been a tendency to portray ontological naturalism as a dogmatic ideological commitment that is more the product of a recent intellectual fashion than science or reasoned argument.  But two developments have contributed to a broad argument in favor of ontological naturalism as the correct description of what sorts of things exist and are causally efficacious.  First, there is a substantial history of the exploration and rejection of a variety of non-physical causal hypotheses in the history of science.  Over the centuries, the possibility that some class of physical events could be caused by a supernatural source, a spiritual source, psychic energy, mental forces, or vital causes have been entertained and found wanting.  Second, evidence for the law of the conservation of energy has provided significant support to physical closure, or the view that the natural world is a complete closed system in which physical events have physical causes.  At the very least, atheists have argued, the ruins of so many supernatural explanations that have been found wanting in the history of science has created an enormous burden of proof that must be met before any claim about the existence of another worldly spiritual being can have credence.  Ontological naturalism should not be seen as a dogmatic commitment, its defenders have insisted, but rather as a defeasible hypothesis that is supported by centuries of inquiry into the supernatural.

As scientific explanations have expanded to include more details about the workings of natural objects and laws, there has been less and less room or need for invoking God as an explanation.  It is not clear that expansion of scientific knowledge disproves the existence of God in any formal sense any more than it has disproven the existence of fairies, the atheistic naturalist argues.  However, physical explanations have increasingly rendered God explanations extraneous and anomalous.  For example, when Laplace, the famous 18th century French mathematician and astronomer, presented his work on celestial mechanics to Napoleon, the Emperor asked him about the role of a divine creator in his system Laplace is reported to have said, “I have no need for that hypothesis.”

In many cases, science has shown that particular ancillary theses of traditional religious doctrine are mistaken.  Blind, petitionary prayer has been investigated and found to have no effect on the health of its recipients, although praying itself may have some positive effects on the person who prayers (Benson, 2006).  Geology, biology, and cosmology have discovered that the Earth formed approximately 3 billion years ago out of cosmic dust, and life evolved gradually over billions of years.  The Earth, humans, and other life forms were not created in their present form some 6,000-10,000 years ago and the atheistic naturalist will point to numerous  alleged miraculous events have been investigated and debunked.

Wide, positive atheism, the view that there are no gods whatsoever, might appear to be the most difficult atheistic thesis to defend, but ontological naturalists have responded that the case for no gods is parallel to the case for no elves, pixies, dwarves, fairies, goblins, or other creates.  A decisive proof against every possible supernatural being is not necessary for the conclusion that none of them are real to be justified.  The ontological naturalist atheist believes that once we have devoted sufficient investigation into enough particular cases and the general considerations about natural laws, magic, and supernatural entities, it becomes reasonable to conclude that the whole enterprise is an explanatory dead end for figuring out what sort of things there are in the world.

The disagreement between atheists and theists continues on two fronts.  Within the arena of science and the natural world, some believers have persisted in arguing that material explanations are inadequate to explain all of the particular events and phenomena that we observe.  Some philosophers and scientists have argued that for phenomena like consciousness, human morality, and some instances of biological complexity, explanations in terms of natural or evolutionary theses have not and will not be able to provide us with a complete picture.  Therefore, the inference to some supernatural force is warranted.  While some of these attempts have received social and political support, within the scientific community the arguments that causal closure is false and that God as a cause is a superior scientific hypothesis to naturalistic explanations have not received significant support.  Science can cite a history of replacing spiritual, supernatural, or divine explanations of phenomena with natural ones from bad weather as the wrath of angry gods to disease as demon possession.  The assumption for many is that there are no substantial reasons to doubt that those areas of the natural world that have not been adequately explained scientifically will be given enough time.  ( Madden and Hare 1968, Papineau, Manson, Nielsen 2001, and Stenger.)  Increasingly, with what they perceive as the failure of attempts to justify theism, atheists have moved towards naturalized accounts of religious belief that give causal and evolutionary explanations of the prevalence of belief.  (See Atrans, Boyer, Dennett 2006)

5. Cognitivism and Non-Cognitivism

In 20th century moral theory, a view about the nature of moral value claims arose that has an analogue in discussions of atheism.  Moral non-cognitivists have denied that moral utterances should be treated as ordinary propositions that are either true or false and subject to evidential analysis.  On their view, when someone makes a moral claim like, “Cheating is wrong,” what they are doing is more akin to saying something like, “I have negative feelings about cheating.  I want you to share those negative feelings.  Cheating.  Bad.”

A non-cognitivist atheist denies that religious utterances are propositions.  They are not the sort of speech act that have a truth value.  They are more like emoting, singing, poetry, or cheering.  They express personal desires, feelings of subjugation, admiration, humility, and love.  As such, they cannot and should not be dealt with by denials or arguments any more than I can argue with you over whether or not a poem moves you.  There is an appeal to this approach when we consider common religious utterances such as, “Jesus loves you.”  “Jesus died for your sins.”  “God be with you.”  What these mean, according to the non-cognitivist, is something like, “I have sympathy for your plight, we are all in a similar situation and in need of paternalistic comforting, you can have it if you perform certain kinds of behaviors and adopt a certain kind of personal posture with regard to your place in the world.  When I do these things I feel joyful, I want you to feel joyful too.”

So the non-cognitivist atheist does not claim that the sentence, “God exists” is false, as such.  Rather, when people make these sorts of claims, their behavior is best understood as a complicated publicizing of a particular sort of subjective sensations.  Strictly speaking, the claims do not mean anything in terms of assertions about what sorts of entities do or do not exist in the world independent of human cognitive and emotional states.  The non-cognitivist characterization of many religious speech acts and behaviors has seemed to some to be the most accurate description.  For the most part, atheists appear to be cognitivist atheists.  They assume that religious utterances do express propositions that are either true or false.  Positive atheists will argue that there are compelling reasons or evidence for concluding that in fact those claims are false.  (Drange 2006, Diamond and Lizenbury 1975, Nielsen 1985)

Few would disagree that many religious utterances are non-cognitive such as religious ceremonies, rituals, and liturgies.   Non-cognitivists have argued that many believers are confused when their speech acts and behavior slips from being non-cognitive to something resembling cognitive assertions about God.  The problem with the non-cognitivist view is that many religious utterances are clearly treated as cognitive by their speakers—they are meant to be treated as true or false claims, they are treated as making a difference, and they clearly have an impact on people’s lives and beliefs beyond the mere expression of a special category of emotions.  Insisting that those claims simply have no cognitive content despite the intentions and arguments to the contrary of the speaker is an ineffectual means of addressing them.  So non-cognitivism does not appear to completely address belief in God.

6. Future Prospects for Atheism

20th century developments in epistemology, philosophy of science, logic, and philosophy of language indicate that many of the presumptions that supported old fashioned natural theology and atheology are mistaken.  It appears that even our most abstract, a priori, and deductively certain methods for determining truth are subject to revision in the light of empirical discoveries and theoretical analyses of the principles that underlie those methods.  Certainty, reasoning, and theology, after Bayes’ work on probability, Wittgenstein’s fideism, Quine’s naturalism, and Kripke’s work on necessity are not what they used to be.  The prospects for a simple, confined argument for atheism (or theism) that achieves widespread support or that settles the question are dim.  That is because, in part, the prospects for any argument that decisively settles a philosophical question where a great deal seems to be at stake are dim.

The existence or non-existence of any non-observable entity in the world is not settled by any single argument or consideration.  Every premise will be based upon other concepts and principles that themselves must be justified.  So ultimately, the adequacy of atheism as an explanatory hypothesis about what is real will depend upon the overall coherence, internal consistency, empirical confirmation, and explanatory success of a whole worldview within which atheism is only one small part.  The question of whether or not there is a God sprawls onto related issues and positions about biology, physics, metaphysics, explanation, philosophy of science, ethics, philosophy of language, and epistemology.  The reasonableness of atheism depends upon the overall adequacy of a whole conceptual and explanatory description of the world.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Atran, Scott, 2002,  In Gods We Trust:  The Evolutionary Landscape of Religion. New York:  Oxford University Press.
    • An evolutionary and anthropological account of religious beliefs and institutions.
  • Benson H, Dusek JA, Sherwood JB, Lam P, Bethea CF, Carpenter W, Levitsky S, Hill PC, Clem DW Jr, Jain MK, Drumel D,Kopecky SL, Mueller PS, Marek D, Rollins S, Hibberd PL. “Study of the Therapeutic Effects of Intercessory Prayer (STEP) in cardiac bypass patients: a multicenter randomized trial of uncertainty and certainty of receiving intercessory prayer.” American Heart Journal, April 2006 151(4):934-42.
  • Blumenfeld, David, 2003,  “On the Compossibility of the Divine Attributes,”  In The Impossibility of God. eds, Martin and Monnier. Amherst, N.Y.:  Prometheus Press.
    • The implications of perfection show that God’s power, knowledge, and goodness are not compatible, so the standard Judeo-Christian divine and perfect being is impossible.
  • Boyer, Pascal 2001, Religion Explained: The Evolutionary Origins of Religious Thought.  New York:  Basic Books.
    • An influential anthropological and evolutionary work.  Religion exists to sustain important aspects of social psychology.
  • Clifford, W.K., 1999, “The Ethics of Belief,”  in The Ethics of Belief and other Essays. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
    • Famously, Clifford argues that it is wrong always and anywhere to believe anything on the basis of insufficient evidence.  Important and influential argument in discussions of atheism and faith.
  • Cowan, J. L., 2003,  “The Paradox of Omnipotence,” In The Impossibility of God. eds, Martin and Monnier. Amherst, N.Y.:  Prometheus Press.
    • No being can have the power to do everything that is not self-contradictory.  That God has that sort of omnipotence is itself self-contradictory.
  • Craig, William L. and Quentin Smith 1995.  Theism, Atheism, and Big Bang Cosmology. N.Y.: Oxford University Press.
    • Craig and Smith have an exchange on the cosmological evidence in favor of theism, for atheism, and Hawking’s quantum cosmology.  The work is part of an important recent shift that takes the products of scientific investigation to be directly relevant to the question of God’s existence.
  • Darwin, Charles,  1871.  The Descent of Man, and the Selection in Relation to Sex. London:  John Murray.
    • Twelve years after The Origin of Species, Darwin makes a thorough and compelling case for the evolution of humans.  He also expands on numerous details of the theory.
  • Darwin, Charles, 1859.  The Origin of Species by Means of Natural Selection. London:  John Murray.
    • Darwin’s first book where he explains his theory of natural selection.  No explicit mention of humans is made, but the theological implications are clear for the teleological argument.
  • Dennett, Daniel, 2006.  Breaking the Spell:  Religion as a Natural Phenomenon. New York:  Viking Penguin.
    • Important work among the so-called New Atheists.  Dennett argues that religion can and should be studying by science.  He outlines evolutionary explanations for religion’s cultural and psychological influence.
  • Diamond, Malcolm L. and Lizenbury, Thomas V. Jr. (eds)  The Logic of God, Indianapolis, Ind.:  Bobbs-Merrill, 1975.
    • A collection of articles addressing the logical coherence of the properties of God.
  • Drange, Theodore, 1998a.  Nonbelief and Evil. Amherst, N.Y.:  Prometheus Books.
    • Drange gives an argument from evil against the existence of the God of evangelical Christianity, and an argument that the God of evangelical Christianity could and would bring about widespread belief, therefore such a God does not exist.
  • Drange, Theodore, 1998b.  “Incompatible Properties Arguments:  A Survey.”  Philo 1: 2.  pp. 49-60.
    • A useful discussion of several property pairs that are not logically compatible in the same being such as:  perfect-creator, immutable-creator, immutable-omniscient, and transcendence-omnipresence.
  • Drange, Theodore,  2006.  “Is “God Exists” Cognitive?”  Philo 8:2.
    • Drange argues that non-cognitivism is not the best way to understand theistic claims.
  • Everitt, Nicholas, 2004.  The Non-Existence of God.  London:  Routledge.
    • Everitt considers and rejects significant recent arguments for the existence of God.  Offers insightful analyses of ontological, cosmological, teleological, miracle, and pragmatic arguments.  The argument from scale and deductive atheological arguments are of particular interest
  • Findlay, J.N.,  1948.  “Can God’s Existence be Disproved?”  Mind 54, pp.  176-83.
    • Influential early argument.  If there is a God, then he will be a necessary being and the ontological argument will succeed.  But the ontological argument and our efforts to make it work have not been successful.  So there is no God.
  • Flew, A. and MacIntyre, A. eds., 1955, New Essays in Philosophical Theology, London: S.C.M. Press.
    • Influential early collection of British philosophers where the influence of the Vienna Circle is evident in the “logical analysis” of religion.  The meaning, function, analysis, and falsification of theological claims and discourse are considered.
  • Flew, Antony. 1955. "Divine Omnipotence and Human Freedom." in New Essays in Philosophical Theology, Anthony Flew and Alasdair MacIntyre (eds.).   New York: Macmilla
    • An early work in deductive atheology that considers the compatibility of God’s power and human freedom.
  • Flew, Antony, 1984.  “The Presumption of Atheism.”  in God, Freedom, and Immortality.  Buffalo, N.Y.: Prometheus Books, pp. 13-30.
    • A collection of Flew’s essays, some of which are now out of date.  The most important are “The Presumption of Atheism,” and “The Principle of Agnosticism.”
  • Flint and Freddoso, 1983. “Maximal Power.”  in The Existence and Nature of God, Alfred J. Freddoso, ed.  Notre Dame, Ind.:  University of Notre Dame Press.
    • Gives an account of omnipotence in terms of possible worlds logic and with the notion of two world sharing histories.  It attempts to avoid a number of paradoxes.
  • Gale, Richard, 1991.  On the Nature and Existence of God. Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press.
    • Gale gives a careful, advanced analysis of several important deductive atheological arguments as well as the ontological and cosmological arguments, and concludes that none for theism are successful.  But he does not address inductive arguments and therefore says that he cannot answer the general question of God’s existence.
  • Grim, Patrick, 1985.  “Against Omniscience:  The Case from Essential Indexicals,”  Nous, 19. pp.  151-180.
    • God cannot be omniscient because it is not possible for him to have indexical knowledge such as what I know when I know that I am making a mess.
  • Grim, Patrick, 1988.  “Logic and Limits of Knowledge and Truth,” Nous 22.  pp.  341-67.
    • Uses Cantor and Gödel to argue that omniscience is impossible within any logic we have.
  • Grim, Patrick, 2007.  "Impossibility Arguments."  in The Cambridge Companion to Atheism, Michael Martin (ed).  N.Y.:  Cambridge University Press.
    • Grim outlines several recent attempts to salvage a workable definition of omnipotence from Flint and Freddoso, Wierenga, and Hoffman and Rosenkrantz.  He argues that they do not succeed leaving God’s power either impossible or too meager to be worthy of God.  Indexical problems with omniscience and a Cantorian problem render it impossible too.
  • Gutting, Gary, 1982.  Religious Belief and Religious Skepticism. Notre Dame, Ind.:  University of Notre Dame Press.
    • Gutting criticizes Wittgensteinians such as Malcolm, Winch, Phillips, and Burrell before turning to Plantinga’s early notion of belief in God as basic to noetic structures.  Useful for addressing important 20th century linguistic and epistemological turns in theism discussions.
  • Harris, Sam, 2005.  The End of Faith. N.Y.:  Norton.
    • Another influential New Atheist work, although it does not contend with the best philosophical arguments for God.  Harris argues that faith is not an acceptable justification for religious belief, particularly given the dangerousness of religious agendas worldwide.  A popular, non-scholarly book that has had a broad impact on the discussion.
  • Hoffman, Joshua and Rosenkrantz, 1988.  “Omnipotence Redux,”  Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 43.  pp.  283-301.
    • Defends Hoffman and Rosenkrantz’s account of omnipotence against criticisms offered by Flint, Freddoso, and Wierenga.
  • Hoffman, Joshua and Rosenkrantz, 2006.  “Omnipotence,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • A good overview of the various attempts to construct a philosophically viable account of omnipotence.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel and Moser, Paul, eds. 2001. Divine Hiddenness:  New Essays. Cambridge University Press.
    • A central collection of essays concerning the question of God’s hiddenness.  If there is a God, then why is his existence not more obvious?
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, 1996.  “The Argument from Divine Hiddenness.”  Canadian Journal of Philosophy 26. 433-53.
    • Howard-Snyder argues that there is a prima facie good reason for God to refrain from entering into a personal relationship with inculpable nonbelievers, so there are good reasons for God to permit inculpable nonbelief.  Therefore, inculpable nonbelief does not imply atheism.
  • Hume, David, 1935.  Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, ed. Norman Kemp Smith, Oxford:  Clarendon Press.
    • Hume offers his famous dialogues between Philo, Demea, and Cleanthes in which he explores the empirical evidence for the existence of God.  No work in the philosophy of religion except perhaps Anselm or Aquinas has received more attention or had more influence.
  • Kitcher, Philip, 1982.  Abusing Science Cambridge, Mass.:  MIT Press.
    • A useful, but somewhat dated and non-scholarly, presentation of the theory of evolution and critique of creationist arguments against it.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, 1966.  “Omniscience and Immutability,” Journal of Philosophy 63.  pp.  409-21.
    • A perfect being is not subject to change.  A perfect being knows everything.  A being that knows everything always knows what time it is.  A being that always knows what time it is subject to change.  Therefore, a perfect being is subject to change.  Therefore, a perfect being is not a perfect being.  Therefore, there is no perfect being.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1982.  The Miracle of Theism.  New York:  Oxford University Press.
    • An influential and comprehensive work.  He rejects many classic and contemporary ontological, cosmological, moral, teleological, evil, and pragmatic arguments.
  • Madden, Edward and Peter Hare, eds., 1968. Evil and the Concept of God. Springfield, IL: Charles C. Thomas.
    • Madden and Hare argue against a full range of theodicies suggesting that the problem of evil cannot be adequately answered by philosophical theology.
  • Manson, Neil A., ed., 2003, God and Design, London: Routledge.
    • The best recent academic collection of discussions of the design argument.
  • Martin, Michael, 1990.   Atheism:  A Philosophical Justification. Philadelphia:  Temple University Press, 1990.
    • A careful and comprehensive work that surveys and rejects a broad range of arguments for God’s existence.  One of the very best attempts to give a comprehensive argument for atheism.
  • Martin, Michael and Ricki Monnier, eds.  2003.  The Impossibility of God. Amherst, N.Y.:  Prometheus Press.
    • An important collection of deductive atheological arguments—the only one of its kind.  A significant body of articles arguing for the conclusion that God not only does not exist, but is impossible.
  • Martin, Michael and Ricki Monnier, eds.  2006.  The Improbability of God. Amherst, N.Y.:  Prometheus Press.
    • The companion to The Impossibility of God. An important collection of inductive atheological arguments distinct from the problem of evil.  God’s existence is unreasonable.
  • Matson, Wallace I., 1965.  The Existence of God. Ithaca, N.Y.:  Cornell University Press.
    • Matson critically scrutinizes the important arguments (of the day) for the existence of God.  He concludes that none of them is conclusive and that the problem of evil tips the balance against.
  • Mavrodes, George, 1977.  “Defining Omnipotence,”  Philosophical Studies, 32.  pp. 191-202.
    • Mavrodes defends limiting omnipotence to exclude logically impossible acts.  It is no limitation upon a being’s power to assert that it cannot perform an incoherent act.
  • McCormick, Matthew, 2000.  “Why God Cannot Think:  Kant, Omnipresence, and Consciousness,”  Philo 3:  1.  pp.  5-19.
    • McCormick argues, on Kantian grounds, that being in all places and all times precludes being conscious because omnipresence would make it impossible for God to make an essential conceptual distinction between the self and not-self.
  • McCormick, Matthew,  2003.  “The Paradox of Divine Agency,” in The Impossibility of God, Martin, Michael and Ricki Monnier, eds.  Amherst, N.Y.:  Prometheus Press.
    • God is traditionally conceived of as an agent, capable of setting goals, willing and performing actions.  God can never act, however, because no state of affairs that deviates from the dictates of his power, knowledge, and perfection can arise.  Therefore, God is impossible.
  • Morris, Thomas, ed. 1987.  The Concept of God, Oxford:  Oxford University Press.
    • A valuable set of discussions about the logical viability of different properties of God and their compatibility.
  • Nielsen, Kai, 1985. Philosophy and Atheism. New York: Prometheus.
    • A useful collection of essays from Nielsen that addresses various, particularly epistemological, aspects of atheism.
  • Nielsen, Kai, 2001. Naturalism and Religion. New York: Prometheus.
    • Defends naturalism as atheistic and adequate to answer a number of larger philosophical questions.  Considers some famous objections to naturalism including fideism and Wittgenstein.
  • Oppy, Graham (1995). Ontological Arguments and Belief in God, N.Y.:  Cambridge University Press.
    • Perhaps the best and most thorough analysis of the important versions of the ontological argument.
  • Oppy, Graham, 2006.  Arguing About Gods. N.Y.:  Cambridge University Press.
    • There are no successful arguments for the existence of orthodoxly conceived monotheistic gods.  This project includes some very good, up to date, analyses of rational belief and belief revision, ontological arguments, cosmological arguments, teleological arguments, Pascal’s wager, and evil.  He sees these all as fitting into a larger argument for agnosticism.
  • Papineau, David, 2007.  "Naturalism," Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • A good general discussion of philosophical naturalism.
  • Rowe, William, 1979.  "The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism," American Philosophical Quarterly 16.  pp.  335-41.
    • A watershed work giving an inductive argument from evil for the non-existence of God.  This article has been anthologized and responded as much or more than any other single work in atheism.
  • Rowe, William L., 1998.  “Atheism.” In E. Craig (Ed.), Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy. London: Routledge.
    • A good but brief survey of philosophical atheism.
  • Rowe, William, 1998.  The Cosmological Argument. N.Y.:  Fordham University Press.
    • Rowe offers a thorough analysis of many important historically influential versions of the cosmological argument, especially Aquinas’, Duns Scotus’s, and Clarke’s.
  • Rowe, William,  2004.  Can God Be Free? Oxford:  Oxford University Press.
    • Rowe considers a range of classic and modern arguments attempting to reconcile God’s freedom in creating the world with God’s omnipotence, omniscience, and perfect goodness. Rowe argues against their compatibility with this principle:   If an omniscient being creates a world when there is a better world that it could have created instead, then it is possible that there exist a being better than it—a being whose degree of goodness is such that it could not create that world when there is a better world it could have created instead.
  • Salmon, Wesley, 1978.  "Religion and Science:  A New Look at Hume's Dialogues," Philosophical Studies 33 (1978):  143-176.
    • A novel Bayesian reconstruction of Hume’s treatment of design arguments.  In general, since it is exceedingly rare for things to be brought into being by intelligence, and it is common for orderly things to come into existence by non-intelligence, it is more probable that the orderly universe is not the product of intelligent design.
  • Schellenberg, J.L., 1993.  Divine Hiddenness and Human Reason.  Ithaca, N.Y.:  Cornell University Press.
    • Schellenberg argues that the absence of strong evidence for theism implies that atheism is true.
  • Schellenberg, J.L., 2006.  "Divine Hiddenness justifies atheism,"  Contemporary Debates in the Philosophy of Religion, ed. Peterson and VanArragon.  Oxford: Blackwell Publishing.  pp. 30-41.
    • Many people search in earnest for compelling evidence for God’s existence, but remain unconvinced and epistemically inculpable.  This state of divine hiddenness itself implies that there is no God, independent of any positive arguments for atheism.
  • Smart, J.C.C.  (2004) “Atheism and Agnosticism”  Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • An outdated and idiosyncratic survey of the topic.  Heavily influenced by positivism from the early 20th century.
  • Smart, J.J.C. and Haldane, John, 2003.  Atheism and Theism. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • An influential exchange between Smart (atheist) and Haldane (theist)
  • Smith, Quentin, 1993.  "Atheism, Theism, and Big Bang Cosmology," in Theism, Atheism, and Big Bang Cosmology. eds. William Lane Craig and Quentin Smith.  Oxford:  Clarendon Press, pp. 195-217.
    • Smith gives a novel argument and considers several objections:  God did not create the big bang.  If he had, he would have ensured that it would unfold into a state containing living creatures.  But the big bang is inherently lawless and unpredictable and is not ensured to unfold this way.
  • Sobel, Jordan Howard, 2004.  Logic and Theism, Arguments for and Against Beliefs in God. Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press.
    • A broad, conventionally structured work in that it covers ontological, cosmological, and teleological arguments, as well as the properties of God, evil, and Pascal.  Notable for its attempts to bring some sophisticated, technical logic tools to the reconstructions and analyses.
  • Stenger, Victor.  2007.  God:  The Failed Hypothesis:  How Science Shows that God Does Not Exist. Prometheus Books.
    • An accessible work that considers scientific evidence that might be construed as against the existence of God:  evolution, supernaturalism, cosmology, prayer, miracles, prophecy, morality, and suffering.   Not a scholarly philosophical work, but interesting survey of relevant empirical evidence.
  • Weisberger, A.M. 1999.  Suffering Belief:  Evil and the Anglo-American Defense of Theism. New York:  Peter Lang Publishing.
    • Weisberger argues that the problem of evil presents a disproof for the existence of the God of classical monotheism.
  • Wierenga, Edward, 1989.  The Nature of God:  An Inquiry Into Divine Attributes. Ithaca, N.Y.:  Cornell University Press.
    • Wierenga offers an important, thorough, and recent attempt to work out the details of the various properties of God and their compatibilities.  He responds to a number of recent counterexamples to different definitions of omnipotence, omniscience, freedom, timelessness, eternality, and so on.  Employs many innovations from developments in modern logic.

Author Information

Matt McCormick
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.


Neo-Stoicism (or Neostoicism) is the name given to a late Renaissance philosophical movement that attempted to revive ancient Stoicism in a form that would be acceptable to a Christian audience. This involved the rejection or modification of certain parts of the Stoic system, especially physical doctrines such as materialism and determinism. The key text founding this movement was Justus Lipsius’s De Constantia ("On Constancy") of 1584. After Lipsius the other key exponent of Neostoicism was Guillaume Du Vair. Other figures that have been associated with this movement include Pierre Charron, Francisco de Quevedo, and Michel de Montaigne.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction: The Word 'Neostoicism'
  2. Background: Church Fathers and the Middle Ages
  3. Justus Lipsius (1547-1606) and the Creation of Neostoicism
  4. Selected Neostoics
    1. Guillaume Du Vair (1556-1621)
    2. Pierre Charron (1541-1603)
    3. Francisco de Quevedo (1580-1645)
    4. Michel de Montaigne (1533-1592)
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction: The Word 'Neostoicism'

The term 'Neostoicism' appears to have been coined by Jean Calvin. In his Institutio Religionis Christianae (‘Institutes of the Christian Religion’) of 1536, Calvin made reference to ‘new Stoics’ (novi Stoici) who attempted to revive the ideal of impassivity (apatheia) instead of embracing the properly Christian virtue of heroically enduring suffering sent by God (Inst. 3.8.9). While the true Christian acknowledges the test sent to him by God, these modern ‘Neostoics’ pretend to deny the existence of such suffering altogether.

Whatever its origins, the term 'Neostoicism' has come to refer to the sixteenth and seventeenth century intellectual movement which attempted to revive ancient Stoic philosophy in a form that would be compatible with Christianity. As Calvin’s objection attests, this was often seen by others to be a very difficult, if not impossible, task. It is also important to stress that this attempt was not merely to revive scholarly interest in ancient Stoic thought (although it often involved this as well) but rather to revive Stoicism as a living philosophical movement by which people could lead their lives.

The central figure in the Neostoic movement was Justus Lipsius. Lipsius's De Constantia ('On Constancy’) may be credited as the inspiration for this movement. This work was first published in 1584, well after Calvin’s reference to contemporary ‘Neostoics’. Whomever Calvin had in mind in his polemic, they did not form part of what is now known as the Neostoic movement. The term’s use now reflects modern scholarly classification rather than Renaissance self-description.

2. Background: Church Fathers and the Middle Ages

Attempts to reconcile Stoicism with Christianity are almost as old as Christianity itself. The earliest attempts can be seen in the works of a number of the Latin Church Fathers. St. Augustine showed sympathy towards the Stoic doctrine of apatheia, while Tertullian was drawn towards Stoic pantheistic materialism. However none of these Christian authors wholly endorsed the Stoic philosophical system. Indeed, they often conflicted with regard to which parts of Stoic philosophy they thought could be reconciled with orthodox Christian teaching. Later Neostoics, especially Justus Lipsius, often drew upon the authority of the Church Fathers, citing their endorsements of certain Stoic ideas, but remaining silent about their doubts.

Stoicism continued to exert influence throughout the Christian Middle Ages. Adaptations of Epictetus's Enchiridion ('Handbook’) were made for use in monasteries (references to ‘Socrates’ were altered to ‘St. Paul’), highlighting the perceived affinity between the Christian and the Stoic way of life. Seneca’s Epistulae (‘Letters’) circulated and appear to have been read by many. Stoic ethical ideas can be seen in the moral works of Peter Abelard, especially in the Dialogus inter Philosophum, Iudaeum et Christianum (‘Dialogue Between a Philosopher, a Jew, and Christian’), and his pupil John of Salisbury.

In each of these instances Stoic moral ideas were taken out of the broader context of the Stoic philosophical system and placed with a Christian context. It is sometimes claimed that this practice simply reflected the predominance of moral themes within the available sources, namely the Latin works of Seneca and Cicero. However, at least some knowledge of Stoic physics was readily accessible in works such as Cicero's De Natura Deorum ('On the Nature of the Gods’), De Divinatione (‘On Divination’), and De Fato (‘On Fate’). The existence of a forged correspondence between Seneca and St. Paul, accepted as genuine by St. Augustine and St. Jerome, may well have contributed to the thought that it was possible to combine Stoic ethics with Christian teaching.

In marked contrast, the attempt to revive Stoic pantheistic physics by David of Dinant ended with declarations of heresy and the burning of books. His identification of God with primary matter led to his condemnation in 1210 and he was forced to flee France. Consequently none of his works survive except as brief quotations in the hostile polemics of St. Albert the Great and St. Thomas Aquinas. Although medieval Christian authorities were apparently open to the use of Stoic ethics as a supplement to Christian teaching, they certainly remained suspicious of Stoic physics, which was at best pantheistic and at worst materialist and atheistic.

This, then, was the background to the late Renaissance attempt to revive Stoicism. Stoic ethics was thought to contain much that could be commended to the Christian, but only if carefully disentangled from Stoic physics. In attempting this careful operation, the remarks of the Church Fathers proved to be especially influential. These impeccable Christian authorities could be cited without fear of reproach from the Church.

3. Justus Lipsius (1547-1606) and the Creation of Neostoicism

Although early Renaissance figures such as Petrarch and Politian displayed an interest in and sympathy for Stoic philosophy, the first concerted attempt to resurrect Stoicism as a living philosophical movement must be credited to the Belgian classical philologist and Humanist Justus Lipsius (1547-1606). Lipsius's fame today rests primarily upon his important critical editions of Seneca and Tacitus. While Seneca taught Lipsius some of the details of Stoic doctrine, Tacitus recorded for him that doctrine 'in action’ in the lives of a number of Roman Stoics.

Lipsius's principal philosophical work, De Constantia ('On Constancy’) of 1584, outlines the way in which a Christian may, in times of trouble, draw upon a Stoic inspired ethic of constancy (constantia) in order help him endure the evils of the world. As Lipsius makes clear in a prefatory letter to the work, he was the first to "have attempted the opening and clearing of this way of wisdom [i.e. Stoicism], so long recluded and overgrown with thorns". Yet in order to do this, Lipsius had to present this pagan philosophy in a form that could be reconciled with Christianity. Thus he makes clear in the same letter that it is only in conjunction with holy scriptures (cum divinis litteris conjuncta) that this ancient way of wisdom (Sapientiae viam) can lead to tranquillity and peace (ad Tranquillitatem et Quietem). In particular, Lipsius draws attention to those parts of Stoic philosophy that the devout Christian must reject (Const. 1.20). These are the claims that (a) God is submitted to fate; (b) that there is a natural order of causes (and thus no miracles); (c) that there is no contingency; (d) that there is no free will. All four of these depend upon the Stoic theory of determinism which, in turn, is based upon Stoic materialism.

Another Stoic doctrine that aroused some controversy was the ideal of impassiveness (apatheia). As we have already seen, it was with reference to this notion that Calvin criticised the 'new Stoics' (novi Stoici) of his day. Christian discussion of this Stoic idea dates back at least to St. Augustine who initially appears to have been sympathetic (e.g. De Ordine) but later became more critical. The issue is closely bound with judgements concerning the power of reason. For the Stoics, the wise man or sage (sophos) can overcome all unwanted emotions by rational analysis of his judgements. For a Christian, however, this should only be possible with the help of God’s grace. It is the love of God, rather than the exercise of philosophical reason, that frees the Christian from mental disturbances. This is the position that St. Augustine affirms in his later works (e.g. De Civitate Dei). It is thus possible, using St Augustine alone, to cite a Church Father both for and against this Stoic doctrine.

The Neostoic must be careful here. Lipsius's entire project in De Constantia is primarily philosophical. His concern is to promote rational reflection concerning emotional distress in order overcome it. Following the Stoic Epictetus, Lipsius affirms that the philosopher’s school should be conceived as a doctor’s surgery (Const. 1.10), a place where one can find medicine for the soul. Thus Lipsius affirms the power of philosophical analysis to enable one to overcome the emotions. This conflicts with the attitudes of both the mature St. Augustine and Calvin. Although Neostoicim includes numerous concessions to Christian teaching, this affirmation of the power of reason shows that its philosophical commitment to Stoicism took priority over a strict adherence to the Christian faith. Neostoics were later criticised for precisely this by Christian authors such as Pascal.

Despite these difficulties, Neostoicism could point to the Stoic affirmation of virtue over pleasure (in opposition to unquestionably heretical Epicureanism) and to the Stoic attitude of indifference towards material possessions. Thus it became commonplace for Christians with Neostoic leanings to affirm the benefit that could be gained from the study of Stoic texts. The first translation of Epictetus's Enchiridion ('Handbook’) into English (in 1567) was prefaced with the remark that "the authoure whereof although he were an ethnicke, yet he wrote very godly & christianly". Similarly, a translation of a Neostoic text into English began with the claim that "philosophie in generall is profitable unto a Christian man, if it be well and rightly used: but no kinde of philosophie is more profitable and neerer approaching unto Christianitie than the philosophie of the Stoicks".

4. Selected Neostoics

Neostoicism was never an organized intellectual movement. Thus modern scholars do not always agree upon a fixed list of 'Neostoics'. When used in its most restricted sense, the term is reserved only for Justus Lipsius and Guillaume Du Vair (see below). When used in its widest sense, it is applied to almost any sixteenth or seventeenth century author whose works display the influence of Stoic ideas. The following are some of the more obvious candidates after Lipsius himself.

a. Guillaume Du Vair (1556-1621)

Guillaume Du Vair was a French statesman, onetime clerk councillor to the Paris parliament, and later Bishop of Lisieux. Du Vair was an admirer of Lipsius and produced his own treatise De la Constance ('On Constancy') in 1594. While Lipsius had been inspired by Seneca, Du Vair drew his inspiration from Epictetus. He translated the latter’s Enchiridion (‘Handbook’) into French (c. 1586) and characterized his own treatise, the Philosophie morale de Stoïques (‘Moral Philosophy of the Stoics’), as merely a reconstructed version of the Enchiridion, rewritten and reorganized in order to make its doctrines more accessible to the public.

In Philosophie morale de Stoïques Du Vair treads a very careful path indeed in his attempt to combine Christianity with his admiration for Epictetus. He suggests that, although it would be improper for anyone to prefer the profane and puddle water of the pagan philosophers to the clear and sacred fountain of God's word, nevertheless the Stoics must be acknowledged as the greatest reproach to Christianity, insofar as they managed to live the noblest and most virtuous lives without the true light of the Christian God to guide them.

Following Epictetus, Du Vair argues that one should not concern oneself with external possessions. In particular, he suggests that the desire for great wealth is often the cause of great unhappiness. If one can free oneself from the passions of hope, despair, fear, and anger, then it will become possible to confront the trials and misfortunes of life without any great concern. Of particular interest, however, is the way in which Du Vair synthesises the Stoic doctrine of apatheia with his Christian belief. For Du Vair, complete mastery of one's passions, achieved via the application of Stoic principles, does not contradict Christian teaching but rather can form the basis for a truly Christian way of life. Only one who has overcome the passions of fear and anger can, for instance, practice true Christian forgiveness towards one’s enemies.

b. Pierre Charron (1541-1603)

Pierre Charron was a French churchman and associate of Michel de Montaigne. He has been characterized as a figure in the Pyrrhonist revival and thus as much of a Neosceptic as a Neostoic, if not more so. His principal philosophical work, De la Sagesse ('On Wisdom'), was first published in 1601. This text focuses upon the image of the Stoic ethical ideal, the wise man or sage (sophos), and the task of progressing towards that ideal. It is not merely a treatise on ethics but primarily a guide to the life of wisdom, a guide to ‘making progress’ (prokopê), following the form of Epictetus’s Enchiridion.

In the first book of De la Sagesse Charron focuses upon self-knowledge and self-examination; in the second book he focuses upon behaviour; in the third he outlines the traditional virtues of prudence, justice, fortitude, and temperance. Charron's text was incredibly popular in its day, having appeared in thirty-six editions by 1672. Yet it is less an original treatise and more a compendium of existing material, drawing upon a variety of other authors both ancient and modern. In particular, Charron has often been accused of plagiarising from Montaigne on a grand scale. He also openly acknowledges his debt to Neostoicism. In one of his prefaratory notes, Charron writes that, "this subject has indeed had a great right done to it by Lipsius already, who wrote an excellent treatise, in a method peculiar to himself, but the substance of it you will find all transplanted here" (Sag. 3.2.Pref.). Charron also acknowledges his debt to Du Vair, "to whom I have been much beholding, and from whom have borrowed a great deal of what I shall say upon this subject of the passions" (Sag. 1.18.Pref).

c. Francisco de Quevedo (1580-1645)

Francisco de Quevedo was a Spanish author who held positions at the royal court. He also produced a Spanish translation of Epictetus and a short work entitled Doctrina Estoica ('Stoic Doctrine') which were published together in 1635. The latter work was the second Neostoic text to appear in Spanish, pre-dated only by a translation of Lipsius’s De Constantia, which appeared in 1616. Here, and throughout his works, Quevedo draws upon both Seneca and Epictetus and quotes both of these Stoic authorities often.

In the Doctrina Estoica (the full title is Nombre, Origen, Intento, Recomendación y Descendencia de la Doctrina Estoica) Quevedo attempted to connect Stoic thought with the Bible. Noting that the founder of Stoicism, Zeno, was of Semitic origin, Quevedo claimed that the biblical account of Job's heroic endurance in the face of adversity was the inspiration behind Stoic philosophy. The doctrines of Epictetus are thus, suggests Quevedo, simply formal ethical principles extrapolated from the actions of Job. Yet despite this bold, if untenable, vindication of Stoicism, Quevedo remains wary of calling himself a Stoic. Thus he concludes the essay by saying "I would not myself boast of being a Stoic, but I hold them in high esteem".

d. Michel de Montaigne (1533-1592)

Although it would probably be incorrect to call the famous French essayist Michel de Montaigne a 'Neostoic', nevertheless a Neostoic tendency can certainly be discerned in his work. He certainly admired Justus Lipsius, describing him as one of the most learned men then alive (Essais 2.12). His general admiration of Seneca can be seen in Essai 2.10, ‘On Books’, and is repeated in Essai 2.32, ‘In Defence of Seneca and Plutarch’. In Essai 1.33 he draws attention to a parallel between Seneca and early Christians with regard to their attitudes towards death, while Essai 1.14 is devoted to an explication of a saying by Epictetus (that men are upset not by things, but by their judgements about things). However, Montaigne’s mature view doubted the rational abilities of man and certainly would not have endorsed the ambitious Stoic ideal of the superhuman sage (sophos). Nevertheless he remained drawn to it, writing that, "if a man cannot attain to that noble Stoic impassibility, let him hide in the lap of this peasant insensitivity of mine. What Stoics did from virtue I teach myself to do from temperament" (Essais 3.10). Montaigne’s engagement with Stoicism thus forms an important part of the revival in interest in Stoic philosophy surrounding Neostoicism.

5. Conclusion

Neostoicism was an important intellectual movement at the end of the sixteenth and beginning of the seventeenth centuries. Yet it is little known to many historians of philosophy. The themes with which it dealt can be seen to form the background to a number of themes in seventeenth century philosophy, especially the accounts of the passions in Descartes and Spinoza.

Moreover, the term 'Neostoicism' is useful to refer to Christian authors inspired by Stoic ethical ideas, for ‘Christian Stoicism’ is, strictly speaking, a contradiction in terms. Although Stoicism may be characterized as a pantheist philosophy, it is also a materialist and determinist philosophy. The orthodox Christian can never, at the same time, be a Stoic. However he can admire certain parts of Stoic ethics and the Neostoic movement indicates that in the late Renaissance many indeed did.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Justus Lipsius

The principal text for Neostoicism is Justus Lipsius's De Constantia. It was translated into English a number of times in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries and one of these was reprinted in 1939:

  • Two Bookes Of Constancie, Englished by Sir John Stradling, Edited with an Introduction by Rudolf Kirk (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press, 1939)

References to other works by Lipsius and studies concerned directly with him can be found at the end of the IEP article Justus Lipsius.

b. Other Neostoics

  • CHARRON, P., De la sagesse livres trois (Bordeaux: Simon Millanges, 1601) and later editions - translated as Of Wisdom, Three Books, Made English by George Stanhope, 2 vols (London, 1697)
  • DU VAIR, G., De la sainte philosophie, Philosophie morale des Stoïques, ed. G. Michaut (Paris: Vrin, 1945) - part translated in The Moral Philosophie of the Stoicks, Englished by Thomas James, Edited by Rudolf Kirk (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press, 1951)
  • MONTAIGNE, M. de, Essais, ed. F. Strowski, sous les auspices de la commission des archives municipales, 5 vols (Bordeaux: Imprimerie Nouvelle F. Pech, 1906-33) - translated as The Complete Essays, trans. M. A. Screech (Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1991)
  • QUEVEDO, F. de, 'Stoic Doctrine', trans. L. Deitz & A. Wiehe-Deitz, in J. Kraye, ed., Cambridge Translations of Renaissance Philosophical Texts 1: Moral Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), 210-225.

c. Studies of Neostoicism

  • COPENHAVER, B. P., & C. B. SCHMITT, Renaissance Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992)
  • ETTINGHAUSEN, H., Francisco de Quevedo and the Neostoic Movement (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1972)
  • LAGRÉE, J., Juste Lipse et la restauration du stoïcisme: Étude et traduction des traités stoïciens De la constance, Manuel de philosophie stoïcienne, Physique des stoïciens (Paris: Vrin, 1994)
  • MOREAU, J.-P., ed., Le stoïcisme au XVIe et au XVIIe siècle (Paris: Albin Michel, 1999)
  • MORFORD, M., Stoics and Neostoics: Rubens and the Circle of Lipsius (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1991)
  • OESTREICH, G., Neostoicism and the Early Modern State, trans. D. McLintock (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982)
  • ZANTA, L., La renaissance du stoïcisme au XVIe siècle (Paris: Champion, 1914)
  • d. Further Studies Dealing with the Influence of Stoicism

  • COLISH, M. L., The Stoic Tradition from Antiquity to the Early Middle Ages, 2 vols (Leiden: Brill, 1985; rev. edn 1990)
  • LAPIDGE, M., 'The Stoic Inheritance', in P. Dronke, ed., A History of Twelfth-Century Western Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988), 81-112.
  • OSLER, M. J., ed., Atoms, Pneuma, and Tranquillity: Epicurean and Stoic Themes in European Thought (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991)
  • REYNOLDS, L. D., The Medieval Tradition of Seneca's Letters (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1965)
  • SPANNEUT, M., Le Stoïcisme des Pères de l'Église: De Clément de Rome à Clément d’Alexandrie (Paris: Seuil, 1957)
  • SPANNEUT, M. Permanence du Stoïcisme: De Zénon à Malraux (Gembloux: Duculot, 1973)
  • VERBEKE, G., The Presence of Stoicism in Medieval Thought (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1983)

Author Information

John Sellars
Email: john.sellars (at)
University of the West of England
United Kingdom

Gabriel Marcel (1889—1973)

The philosophical approach known as existentialism is commonly recognized for its view that life’s experiences and interactions are meaningless.  Many existentialist thinkers are led to conclude that life is only something to be tolerated, and that close or intimate relationships with others should be avoided. Heard distinctly among this despair and dread was the original philosophical voice of Gabriel Marcel.  Marcel, a World War I non-combatant veteran, pursued the life of an intellectual, and enjoyed success as a playwright, literary critic, and concert pianist.  He was trained in philosophy by Henri Bergson, among others.  A prolific life-long writer, his early works reflected his interest in idealism.  As Marcel developed philosophically, however, his work was marked by an emphasis on the concrete, on lived experience.  After converting to Catholicism in 1929, he became a noted opponent of atheistic existentialism, and primarily that of Jean-Paul Sartre.  Sartre’s characterizations of the isolated self, the death of God, and lived experience as having “no exit” especially disgusted Marcel.  Regardless of his point of departure, Marcel throughout his life balked at the designation of his philosophy as, “Theistic existentialism.”  He argued that, though theism was consistent with his existentialism, it was not an essential characteristic of it.

Marcel’s conception of freedom is the most philosophically enduring of all of his themes, although the last decade has seen a resurgence of attention paid to Marcel’s metaphysics and epistemology.  A decidedly unsystematic thinker, it is difficult to categorize Marcel’s work, in large part because the main Marcelian themes are so interconnected.  A close read, however, shows that in addition to that of freedom, Marcel’s important philosophical contributions were on the themes of participation, creative fidelity, exigence, and presence.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Freedom
  3. Participation
  4. Creative Fidelity
  5. Exigence
  6. Presence
  7. Hope and the Existential Self
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gabriel Marcel was born in Paris in 1889, the city where he also died in 1973.  Marcel was the only child of Henri and Laure Marcel.  His father was a French diplomat to Sweden and was committed to educating his son through frequent travel across Europe.  The death of his mother, in 1893 when Gabriel was not quite four years old left an indelible impression on him.  He was raised primarily by his mother’s sister, whom his father married two years after Laure’s passing, and though “Auntie” loved her nephew and gave him the best formal education, Gabriel loathed the structure of the classroom, and became excited about the intellectual life only after entering Sorbonne, from which he graduated in 1910.

Marcel was not a “dogmatic pacifist,” but experiences in World War I as a non-combatant solidified to Marcel the, “Desolate aspect that it [war] became an object of indignation, a horror without equal,” (AE 20) and contributed to a life-long fascination with death.  It was during the war that many of the important philosophical themes in Marcel’s later work would take root, and indeed, during the war, Marcel began writing in a journal that served as a framework for his first book, Metaphysical Journal (1927).

After the war, Marcel married Jaqueline Boegner, and he taught at a secondary school in Paris.  It was in these early wedded years that Marcel became engaged as a playwright, philosopher, and literary critic.  The couple continued to travel, they adopted a son, Jean Marie, and Marcel developed friendships with important thinkers of the day.  Marcel gave talks throughout Europe as a result of these contacts, and was regarded as a keen mind and a type of renaissance figure, excelling in music, drama, philosophy, theology, and politics.  As for his literary works, Marcel in total published more than 30 plays, a number of which have been translated in English and produced in the United States.  Marcel was acutely aware, however, that his dramatic work did not enjoy the popularity of his philosophical work, but he believed nonetheless that both were, “Capable of moving and often of absorbing readers very different from one another, living in the most diverse countries—beings whom it is not a question of counting precisely because they are human beings and belong as such to an order where number loses all meaning,” (AE, 27).

Although Marcel did not pursue anything more permanent than intermittent teaching posts at secondary schools, he did hold prestigious lectureships, giving the Gifford Lectures at Aberdeen in 1949-50 and the William James Lectures at Harvard in 1961.  His most significant philosophical works include Being and Having (1949), The Mystery of Being, Volume I and II (1950-51), Man against Mass Society (1962) and Creative Fidelity (1964). During his latter years, he emerged as a vocal political thinker, and played a crucial role in organizing and advocating the international Moral Re-Armament movement of the 1960s.  (Marcel was pleased to be awarded the Peace Prize of the Börsenverein des Buchhandels in 1964.)

Throughout his life, Marcel sought out, and was sought out by, various influential thinkers, including Paul Ricoeur, Jacques Maritain, Charles Du Bos, Gustave Thibon, and Emmanuel Levinas.  In spite of the many whom he positively influenced, Marcel became known for his very public disagreements with Jean-Paul Sartre.  In fact, the acrimony between the two became such that the two would attend performances of the other’s plays, only to storm out midway.  Perhaps the most fundamental ideological disagreement between the two was over the notion of autonomy.  For Marcel, autonomy is a discovery of the self as a being receptive to others, rather than as a power to be exerted.  Marcel’s autonomy is rooted in a commitment to participation with others (see 3 below), and is unique in that the participative subject is committed by being encountered, or approached by, another individual’s need.  Sartre’s notion of commitment is based on the strength of the solitary decisions made by individuals who have committed themselves fully to personal independence.  Yet, Marcel took commitment to be primarily the response to the appeal directed to the self as an individual (A 179) so that the self is free to respond to another on account of their mutual needs.  The feud between the two, though heated, had the effect of casting a shadow over Marcel’s work as “mysticism” rather than philosophy, a stigma that Marcel would work for the rest of his life to dispute.

2. Freedom

A strange inner mutation is spreading throughout humanity, according to Marcel.  As odd as it first seems, this mutation is evoked by the awareness that members of humanity are contingent on conditions which make up the framework for their very existence.  Man recognizes that at root, he is an existing thing, but he somehow feels compelled to prove his life is more significant than that.  He begins to believe that the things he surrounds himself with can make his life more meaningful or valuable.  This belief, says Marcel, has thrown man into a ghostly state of quandary caused by a desire to possess rather than to be.  All people become a master of defining their individual selves by either their possessions or by their professions.  Meaning is forced into life through these venues.  Even more, individuals begin to believe that their lives have worth because they are tied to these things, these objects.  This devolution creates a situation in which individuals experience the self only as a statement, as an object, “I am x.”

The objectification of the self through one’s possessions robs one of her freedom, and separates her from the experiences of her own participation in being.  The idolatrous world of perverted possession must be abandoned if the true reality of humanity is to be reached (SZ 285).  Perhaps most known for his views on freedom, Marcel gave to existentialism a view of freedom that marries the absolute indeterminacy of traditional existentialism with Marcel’s view that transcendence out of facticity can only come by depending upon others with the same goals.  The result is a type of freedom-by-degrees in which all people are free, since to be free is to be self-governing, but not all people experience freedom that can lead them out of objectification.  The experience of freedom cannot be achieved unless the subject extricates herself from the grip of egocentrism, since freedom is not simply doing what desire dictates.  The person who sees herself as autonomous within herself  has a freedom based on ill-fated egocentrism.  She errs in believing freedom to be rooted on independence.

Freedom is defined by Marcel in both a negative and positive sense.  Negatively, freedom is, “The absence of whatever resembles an alienation from oneself,” and positively as when, “The motives of my action are within the limits of what I can legitimately consider as the structural traits of my self,” (TF, 232).  Freedom, then, is always about the possibilities of the self, understood within the confines of relationships with others.  As an existentialist, Marcel’s freedom is tied to the raw experiences of the body.  However, the phenomenology of Marcelian freedom  is characterized by his insistence that freedom is something to be experienced, and the self is fully free when it is submerged in the possibilities of the self and the needs of others.  Although all humans have basic, autonomous freedom (Marcel thought of this as “capricious” freedom), in virtue of their embodiment and consciousness; only those persons who seek to experience being by freely engaging with other free beings can break out of the facticity of the body and into the fulfillment of being.  The free act is significant because it contributes to defining the self, “By freedom I am given back to myself,” (VII vii).

At first glance, Marcelian freedom is paradoxical:  the more one enters into a self-centered project, the less legitimate it is to say that the act is free, whereas the more the self is engaged with other free individuals, the more the self is free.  However, the phenomenological experience of freedom is less paradoxical when it is seen through the lens of the engagement of freedom.  Ontologically, we rarely have experiences of the singular self; instead, our experiences are bound to those with whom we interact.  Freedom based on the very participation that the free act seeks to affirm is the ground of the true experience of freedom towards which Marcel gravitates.

3. Participation

Marcel was an early proponent of what would become a major Sartrean existential tenet:  I am my body.  For Marcel, the body does not have instrumental value, nor is it simply a part or extension of the self.  Instead, the self cannot be eradicated from the body.  It is impossible for the self to conceive of the body in any way at all except for as a distinct entity identified with the self (CF 23).  Existence is prior, and existence is prior to any abstracting that we do on the basis of our perception.  Existence is indubitable, and existence is in opposition to the abstraction of objectivity (TW 225).  That we are body, of course, naturally lends us to think of the body in terms of object.  But individuals who resort to seeing the self and the world in terms of functionality are ontologically deficient because not only can they not properly respond to the needs of others, but they have become isolated and independent from others.  It is our active freedom that prevents us from the snare of objectifying the self, and which brings us into relationships with others.

When we are able to act freely, we can move away from the isolated perspective of the problematic man (“I am body only,”) to that of the participative subject (“I am a being among beings”) who is capable of interaction with others in the world.  Marcelian participation is possible through a special type of reflection in which the subject views herself as a being among beings, rather than as an object.  This reflection is secondary reflection, and is distinguished from both primary reflection and mere contemplation.  Primary reflection explains the relationship of an individual to the world based on her existence as an object in the world, whereas secondary reflection takes as its point of departure the being of the individual among others.  The goal of primary reflection, then, is to problematize the self and its relation to the world, and so it seeks to reduce and conquer particular things.  Marcel rejects primary reflection as applicable to ontological matters because he believes it cannot understand the main metaphysical issue involved in existence:  the incommunicable experience of the body as mine.  Neither does mere contemplation suffice to explain this phenomenon.  Contemplation is existentially significant, because it indicates the act by which the self concentrates its attention on its self, but such an act without secondary reflection would result in the same egocentrism that Marcel attempts to avoid through his work.

Secondary reflection has as its goal the explication of existence, which cannot be separated from the individual, who is in turn situated among others.  For Marcel, an understanding of one’s being is only possible through secondary reflection, since it is a reflection whereby the self asks itself how and from what starting point the self is able to proceed (E 14).  The existential impetus of secondary reflection cannot be overemphasized for Marcel:  Participation which involves the presence of the self to the world is only possible if the temptation to assume the self is wholly distinct from the world is overcome (CF 22).  The existential upshot is that secondary reflection allows the individual to seek out others, and it dissolves the dualism of primary reflection by realizing the lived body’s relation to the ego.

Reflexive reflection is the reflection of the exigent self (see 5 below).  It occurs when the subject is in communion with others, and is free and also dependent upon others (as discussed in 2).  Reflexive reflection is an inward looking that allows the self to be receptive to the call of others.  Yet, Marcel does not call on the participative subject to be reflective for receptivity’s sake.  Rather, the self cannot fully understand the existential position without orientating itself to something other than the self.

4. Creative Fidelity

For Marcel, to exist only as body is to exist problematically.  To exist existentially is to exist as a thinking, emotive, being, dependent upon the human creative impulse.  He believed that, “As soon as there is creation, we are in the realm of being,” and also that, “There is no sense using the word ‘being’ except where creation is in view,” (PGM xiii).  The person who is given in a situation to creative development experiences life qualitatively at a higher mode of being than those for whom experiences are another facet of their functionality.  Marcel argues that, “A really alive person is not merely someone who has a taste for life, but somebody who spreads that taste, showering it, as it were, around him; and a person who is really alive in this way has, quite apart from any tangible achievements of his, something essentially creative about him,” (VI, 139).  This is not to say, of course, that the creative impulse is measurable by what we produce.  Whereas works of art most explicitly express creative energy, inasmuch as we give ourselves to each other, acts of love, admiration, and friendship also describe the creative act.  In fact, participation with others is initiated through acts of feeling which not only allow the subject to experience the body as his own, but which enable him to respond to others as embodied, sensing, creative, participative beings as well.  To feel is a mode of participation, a creative act which draws the subject closer to an experience of the self as a being-among-beings, although higher degrees of participation are achieved by one whose acts demonstrate a commitment to that experience.  So, to create is to reject the reduction of the self to the level of abstraction—of object, “The denial of the more than human by the less than human,” (CF 10).

If the creative élan is a move away from the objectification of humanity, it must be essentially tied relationally to others.  Creative fidelity, then, entails a commitment to acts which draw the subject closer to others, and this must be balanced with a proper respect for the self.  Self-love, self-satisfaction, complacency, or even self-anger are attitudes which can paralyze one’s existential progress and mitigate against the creative impulse.  To be tenacious in the pursuit-- the fidelity aspect-- is the most crucial part of the creative impulse, since creation is a natural outflow of being embodied.  One can create, and create destructively.  To move towards a greater sense of being, one must have creative fidelity.  Fidelity exists only when it triumphs over the gap in presence from one being to another—when it helps others relate, and so defies absences in presence (CF 152).

It is not enough to be constant, since constancy is tenacity towards a specific goal, which requires neither presence nor an openness to change.  Rather, creative fidelity implies that there is presence, if it is true that faithfulness requires being available (in the Marcelian sense, see 5) to another even when it is difficult.  (Interestingly, Marcel’s notion of fidelity means more than someone’s merely not being unfaithful.  A spouse, for example, might not physically cheat on her husband, but on Marcel’s view, if she remains unavailable to her partner, she can only be called “constant”.  She cannot be called “faithful”.)  Additionally, fidelity requires that a subject be open to changing her mind, actions, and beliefs if those things do not contribute to a better grasp of what it means to be.  Since fidelity is a predicate that is best ascribed by others to us, it follows that receptivity to the views of others’ is a natural component of fidelity.

But what is it that Marcel thinks we ought to be faithful towards? It isn’t simply to pursue the impetus of the exigent life, although that is involved.  More concretely, creative fidelity is a fidelity towards being free, and that freedom involves making decisions about what is important, rather than living in a state of stasis.  Marcel railed against indecision with respect to what is essential, even though such indecision, “Seems to be the mark and privilege of the illumined mind,” (CF 190) because truly free people are not entrapped by their beliefs, but are liberated by living out their consequences (see 2).

5. Exigence

Dominating Marcel’s philosophical development was the intersection of his interest in the individuality of beings and his interest in the relations which bind beings together.  An acceptable ontology must account for the totality of the lived experience, and so must have as a point of departure the fact that humans are fundamentally embodied.  From there, ontology must explain how an individual fits among other individuals, and so must account for what it means to experience and have relations in the world.  Ontological exigence is the Marcelian actualization of transcendence, which is manifested as a thirst for the fullness of being and a demand to transcend the wor