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Leibniz: Logic

LeibnizThe revolutionary ideas of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) on logic were developed by him between 1670 and 1690. The ideas can be divided into four areas: the Syllogism, the Universal Calculus, Propositional Logic, and Modal Logic.

These revolutionary ideas remained hidden in the Archive of the Royal Library in Hanover until 1903 when the French mathematician Louis Couturat published the Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz. Couturat was a great admirer of Leibniz’s thinking in general, and he saw in Leibniz a brilliant forerunner of modern logic. Nevertheless he came to the conclusion that Leibniz’s logic had largely failed and that in general the so-called “intensional” approach to logic was necessarily bound to fail. Similarly, in their standard historiography of logic, W. & M. Kneale (1962) maintained that Leibniz “never succeeded in producing a calculus which covered even the whole theory of the syllogism”. Even in recent years, scholars like Liske (1994), Swoyer (1995), and Schupp (2000) argued that Leibniz’s intensional conception must give rise to inconsistencies and paradoxes.

On the other hand, starting with Dürr (1930), Rescher (1954), and Kauppi (1960), a certain rehabilitation of Leibniz’s intensional logic may be observed which was by and by supported and supplemented by Poser (1969), Ishiguro (1972), Rescher (1979), Burkhardt (1980), Schupp (1982), and Mugnai (1992). However, the full wealth of Leibniz’s logical ideas became visible only in Lenzen (1990), (2004a), and (2004b), where the many pieces and fragments were joined together to an impressive system of four calculi:

  • The algebra of concepts L1 (which turns out to be deductively equivalent to the Boolean algebra of sets)
  • The quantificational system L2 (where “indefinite concepts” function as quantifiers ranging over concepts)
  • A propositional calculus of strict implication (obtained from L1 by the strict analogy between the containment-relation among concepts and the inference-relation among propositions)
  • The so-called “Plus-Minus-Calculus” (which is to be viewed as a theory of set-theoretical containment, “addition,” and “subtraction”).

Table of Contents

  1. Leibniz’s Logical Works
  2. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism
    1. Axiomatization of the Theory of the Syllogism
    2. The Semantics of “Characteristic Numbers”
    3. Linear Diagrams and Euler-circles
  3. Works on the Universal Calculus
    1. The Algebra of Concepts L1
    2. The Quantificational System L2
    3. The Plus-Minus-Calculus
  4. Leibniz’s Calculus of Strict Implication
  5. Works on Modal Logic
    1. Possible-Worlds-Semantics for Alethic Modalities
    2. Basic Principles of Deontic Logic
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Abbreviations for Leibniz’s works
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Leibniz’s Logical Works

Throughout his life (beginning in 1646 in Leipzig and ending in 1716 in Hanover), Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz did not publish a single paper on logic, except perhaps for the mathematical dissertation “De Arte Combinatoria” and the juridical disputa­tion “De Conditionibus” (GP 4, 27-104 and AE IV, 1, 97-150; the abbrevi­ations for Leibniz’s works are resolved in section 6). The former work deals with some issues in the theory of the syllogism, while the latter contains investigations of what is nowadays called deontic logic. Leibniz’s main aim in logic, however, was to extend the traditional syllogistic to a “Universal Calculus.” Although there exist several drafts of such a calculus which seem to have been composed for publication, none of them was eventually sent to press. So Leibniz’s logical essays appeared only posthumously. The early editions of his philosophical works, however, contained only a small selection of logical papers. It was not before the beginning of the 20th century that the majority of his logical fragments became generally accessible by the valuable edition of Louis Couturat.

Since only few manuscripts were dated by Leibniz, his logical oeuvre shall not be described here in chronological order but from a merely systematic point of view by distinguishing four groups:

  1. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism
  2. Works on the Universal Calculus
  3. Works on Propositional Logic
  4. Works on Modal Logic.

2. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism

Leibniz’s innovations within the theory of the syllogism comprise at least three topics:

(a)   An "Axiomatization" of the theory of the syllogism, that is, a reduction of the traditional inferences to a small number of basic laws which are sufficient to derive all other syllogisms.

(b)   The development of the semantics of so-called "characteristic num­bers" for evaluating the logical validity of a syllogistic inference.

(c)    The invention of two sorts of graphical devices, that is to say, linear diagrams and (later) so-called "Euler-circles," as a heuristic for checking the validity of a syllogism.

a. Axiomatization of the Theory of the Syllogism

In the 17th century, logic was still strongly influenced, if not dominated, by syllogistic, that is, by the traditional theory of the four categorical forms:

Universal affirmative proposition (UA)        Every S is P          SaP

Universal negative proposition (UN)              No S is P               SeP

Particular affirmative proposition (PA)         Some S is P          SiP

Particular negative proposition (PN)              Some S isn’t P      SoP

A typical textbook of that time is the famous “Logique de Port Royal” (Arnauld & Nicole (1683)) which, apart from an introductory investigation of ideas, concepts, and propositions in general, basically consists of:

(i)       The theory of the so-called “simple” laws of subalternation, oppo­sition, and conversion;

(ii)      The theory of the syllogistic “moods” which are classified into four different “figures” for which specific rules hold.

As Leibniz defines it, a “subalternation takes place whenever a particular proposition is inferred from the corresponding universal proposition” (Cout, 80), that is:

SUB 1            SaP → SiP

SUB 2            SeP → SoP.

According to the modern analysis of the categorical forms in terms of first order logic, these laws are not strictly valid but hold only under the assumption that the subject term S is not empty. This problem of "existential import" will be discussed below.

The theory of opposition first has to determine which propositions are contradictories of each other in the sense that they can neither be together true nor be together false. Clearly, the PN is the contradictory, or negation, of the UA, while the PA is the negation of the UN:

OPP 1            ¬SaP ↔ SoP

OPP 2            ¬SeP ↔ SiP.

The next task is to determine which propositions are contraries to each other in the sense that they cannot be together true, while they may well be together false. As Leibniz states in “Theorem 6: The universal affirmative and the universal negative are contrary to each other” (Cout, 82). Finally, two propositions are said to be subcontraries if they cannot be together false while it is possible that are together true. As Leibniz notes in another theorem, the two particular propositions, SiP and SoP, are logically related to each other in this way. The theory of subalternation and opposition is often summarized in the familiar “Square of Opposition”:


In the paper “De formis syllogismorum Mathematice definiendis” written around 1682 (Cout, 410-416, and the text-critical edition in AE VI, 4, 496-505) Leibniz tackled the task of "axiomatizing" the theory of the syllogistic figures and moods by reducing them to a small number of basic principles. The “Fundamentum syllogisticum”, that is, the axiomatic basis of the theory of the syllogism, is the “Dictum de omni et nullo” (The saying of ‘all’ and ‘none’):

If a total C falls within another total D, or if the total C falls outside D, then whatever is in C, also falls within D (in the former case) or outside D (in the latter case) (Cout, 410-411).

These laws warrant the validity of the following "perfect" moods of the “First Figure”:

BARBARA        CaD, BaC → BaD

CELARENT      CeD, BaC → BeD

DARII                 CaD, BiC → BiD

FERIO                 CeD, BiC → BoD.

On the one hand, if the second premise of the affirmative moods BARBARA and DARII is satisfied, that is, if B is either totally or partially contained in D, then, according to the “Dictum de Omni”, also B must be either totally or partially contained in D since, by the first premise, C is entirely contained in D. Similarly the negative moods CELARENT and FERIO follow from the “Dictum de Nullo”: “B is either totally or partially contained in C; but the entire C falls outside D; hence also B either totally or partially falls outside D” (Cout, 411).

Next Leibniz derives the laws of subalternation from the syllogisms DARII and FERIO by substituting ‘B’ for ‘C’ and ‘C’ for ‘D’, respectively. This derivation (and hence also the validity of the laws of subalternation) tacitly presupposes the following principle which Leibniz considered as an “identity”:

SOME             BiB.

With the help of the laws of subalternation, BARBARA and CELARENT may be "weakened" into

BARBARI      CaD, BaC → BiD

CELARO        CeD, BaC → BoD.

Thus the First Figure altogether has six valid moods, from which one obtains six moods of the Second and six of the Third Figure by means of a logical inference-scheme called “Regressus”:

REGRESS      If a conclusion Q logically follows from premises P1, P2, but if Q is false, then one of the premises must be false.

When Leibniz carefully carries out these derivations, he presupposes the laws of opposition, Opp 1, Opp 2. Finally, six valid moods of the Fourth Figure can be derived from corresponding moods of the First Figure with the help of the laws of conversions.According to traditional doctrines, the PA and the UN may be converted “simpliciter”, while the UA can only be converted “per accidens”:

CONV 1          BiD → DiB

CONV 2          BeD → DeB

CONV 3          BaD → DiB.

As Leibniz shows, these laws can in turn be derived from some previously proven syllogisms with the help of the "identical" proposition:

ALL                BaB.

Furthermore one easily obtains another law of conversion according to which the UN can also be converted "accidentally":

CONV 4          BeD → DoB.

The announced derivation of the moods of the Fourth Figure was not carried out in the fragment “De formis syllogismorum Mathematice definiendis” which just breaks off with a reference to “Figura Quarta”. It may, however, be found in the manuscript LH IV, 6, 14, 3 which, unfortunately, was only partially edited in Cout, 204. At any rate, Leibniz managed to prove that all valid moods can be reduced to the “Fundamentum syllogisticum” in conjunction with the laws of opposition, the inference scheme “Regressus”, and the "identical" propositions SOME and ALL.

Now while ALL is an identity or theorem of first order logic, ∀x(Bx → Bx), SOME is nowadays interpreted as ∃x(Bx ∧ Bx). This formula is equivalent to ∃x(Bx), that is, to the assumption that there "exists" at least one x such that x is B. Hence the laws of subalternation presuppose that each concept B (which can occupy the position of the subject of a categorical form) is "non-empty". Leibniz discussed this problem of "existential import" in a paper entitled “Difficultates quaedam logicae” (GP 7, 211-217) where he distinguished two kinds of "existence": Actual existence of the individuals inhabiting our real world vs. merely possible subsistence of individuals “in the region of ideas”. According to Leibniz, logical inferences should always be evaluated with reference to “the region of ideas”, that is, the larger set of all possible individuals. Therefore all that is required for the validity of subalternation is that the term B occupying the position of the subject of a categorical form has a non-empty extension within the domain of possible individuals. As will turn out below (compare the definition of an extensional interpretation of L1 in section 3.1), this weak condition of "existential import" becomes tantamount to the assumption that the respective concept B is self-consistent!

b. The Semantics of “Characteristic Numbers”

In a series of papers of April 1679, Leibniz elaborated the idea of assigning natural numbers to the subject and predicate of a proposition a in such a way that the truth of a can be "read off" from these numbers. Apparently Leibniz was hoping that mankind might once discover the "true" characteristic numbers which would enable one to determine the truth of arbitrary propositions just by mathematical calculations! In the essays of April 1679, however, he pursued only the much more modest goal of defining appropriate arithmetical conditions for determining whether a syllogistic inference is logically valid. This task was guided by the idea that a term composed of concepts A and B gets assigned the product of the numbers assigned to the components:

For example, since ‘man’ is ‘rational animal’, if the number of ‘animal’, a, is 2, and the number of ‘rational’, r, is 3, then the number of ‘man’, m, will be the same as a*r, in this example 2*3 or 6. (LLP, 17).

Now a UA like ‘All gold is metal’ can be understood as maintaining that the concept ‘gold’ contains the concept ‘metal’ (because ‘gold’ can be defined as ‘the heaviest metal’). Therefore it seems obvious to postulate that in general ‘Every S is P’ is true if and only if s, the characteristic number assigned to S, contains p, the number assigned to P, as a prime factor; or, in other words, s must be divisible by p. In a first approach, Leibniz thought that the truth-conditions for the particular proposition ‘Some S are P’ might be construed similarly by requiring that either s can be divided by p or conversely p can be divided by s. But this was mistaken. After some trials and errors, Leibniz found the following more complicated solution:

(i)     To every term T, a pair of natural numbers <+t1;-t2> is assigned such that t1 and t2 are relatively prime, that is, they don’t have a common divisor.

(ii)    The UA ‘Every S is P’ is true (relative to the assignment (i)) if and only if +s1 is divisible by +p1 and -s2 is divisible by -p2.

(iii)   The UN ‘No S is P’ is true if and only if +s1 and -p2 have a common divisor or +p1 and -s2 have a common divisor.

(iv)   The PA ‘Some S is P’ is true if and only if condition (iii) is not satisfied.

(v)    The PN ‘Some S isn’t P’ is true if and only if condition (ii) is not satisfied.

(vi)   An inference from premises P1, P2 to the conclusion C is logically valid if and only if for each assignment of numbers satisfying condition (i), C becomes true whenever both P1 and P2 are true.

As was shown by Lukasiewicz (1951), this semantics satisfies the simple inferences of opposition, subalternation, and conversion, as well as all (and only) the syllogisms which are commonly regarded as valid. Leibniz tried to generalize this semantics for the entire algebra of concepts, but he never found a way to cope with negative concepts. This problem has only been solved by contemporary logicians; compare Sanchez-Mazas (1979), Sotirov (1999).

c. Linear Diagrams and Euler-circles

In the paper “De Formae Logicae Comprobatione per Linearum ductus” probably written after 1686 (Cout, 292-321), Leibniz elaborated two methods for representing the content of categorical propositions. The UA, for example, ‘Every man is an animal’, can be represented either by two nested circles or by two horizontal lines which symbolize that the extension of B is contained in the extension of C (the subsequent graphics are scans from Cout, 292-295):


In the case of a UN like ‘No man is a stone’, one obtains the following diagrams which symbolize that the extension of B is set-theoretically disjoint from the extension of C:


Similarly, the following circles and lines symbolize that, in the case of a PA like ‘Some men are wise’, the extensions of B and C overlap:


Finally, in the case of a PN like ‘Some men are not ruffians’, the diagrams are meant to symbolize that the extension of B is partially disjoint from the extension of C,that is, that some elements of B are not elements of C:


These diagrams may then be used to check whether a given inference is valid. Thus, for example, the validity of FERIO can be illustrated as follows:


Here the conclusion ‘Some D is not B’ follows from the premises ‘No C is B’ and ‘Some D is C’ because the elements of D which are in C can’t be elements of B. On the other hand, invalid syllogisms as, for example, the mood “AOO” of the Fourth Figure, can be refuted as follows:


As the diagram illustrates, the truth of the premises ‘Every B is C’ and ‘Some C is not D’ is compatible with a situation where the conclusion ‘Some D is not B’ is false, that is, where ‘Every D is B’ is true.

Of course, Leibniz’s diagrams which were re-discovered in the 18th century among others by Euler (1768) are not without problems. In particular, the circles for the PA and the PN are somewhat inaccurate because they basic­ally visualize one and the same state of affairs, namely that (i) some B are C, and (ii) some B are not C, and also (iii) some C are not B. The need to distinguish between different situations such as ((i) & (ii)) in contrast to ((i) & not (ii)) led to improvements of the method of "Euler-circles" as suggested by Venn (1881), Hamilton (1861), and others. Note, incidentally, that, in the GI, Leibniz himself improved the linear diagrams for the UA, PA and PN by drawing perpendicular lines symbolizing the “maximum”,that is, “the limits beyond which the terms cannot, and within which they can, be extended”. At the same time he used a double horizontal line to symbolize “the minimum, that is, that which cannot be taken away without affecting the relation of the terms” (LLP, 73-4, fn. 2).

3. Works on the Universal Calculus

In the period between, roughly, 1679 and 1690, Leibniz spent much effort to generalize the traditional logic to a “Universal Calculus”. At least three different calculi may be distinguished:

(a) The algebra of concepts which is provably equivalent to the Boolean algebra of sets;

(b)   A fragmentary quantificational system in which the quantifiers range over concepts but in which quantification over individuals may be introduced by definition;

(c) The so-called "Plus-Minus-calculus" which constitutes an abstract system of "real addition" and "subtraction". When this calculus is applied to concepts, it yields a weaker logic than the full algebra (a).

a. The Algebra of Concepts L1

The algebra of concepts grows out of the syllogistic framework by three achievements. First, Leibniz drops the informal quantifier expression ‘every’ and formulates the UA simply as “A is B” or, equivalently, as “A contains B”. This fundamental proposition shall here be symbolized as A∈B while its negation will be abbreviated as A∉B. Second, Leibniz introduces an operator of conceptual conjunction which combines two concepts A and B into AB (sometimes also written as “A+B”). Third, Leibniz allows the unrestricted use of conceptual negation which shall here be symbolized as ~A (“Not-A”). Hence, in particular, one can form the inconsistent concept A~A (“A Not-A”) and its tautological counterpart ~(A~A).

Identity or coincidence of concepts might be defined as mutual containment:

DEF 1            (A = B) =df (A∈B) ∧ (B∈A).

Alternatively, the algebra of concepts can be built up with ‘=’ as a primitive operator while ‘∈’ is defined by:

DEF 2            (A∈B) =df (A = AB).

Another important operator may be introduced by definition. Concept B is possible if B does not contain a contradiction like A~A:

DEF 3            P(B) =df (B∉A~A).

Leibniz uses many different locutions to express the self-consistency of a concept A. Instead of ‘A est possibile’ he often says ‘A est res’, ‘A est ens’; or simply ‘A est’. In the opposite case of an impossible concept he also calls A a "false term" (“terminus falsus”).

Identity can be axiomatized by the law of reflexivity in conjunction with the rule of substitutivity:

IDEN 1            A = A

IDEN 2            If A = B, then α[A] ↔ α[B].

By means of these principles, one easily derives the following corollaries:

IDEN 3            A = B → B = A

IDEN 4            A = B ∧ B = C → A = C

IDEN 5            A = B → ~A = ~B

IDEN 6            A = B → AC = BC.

The following laws express the reflexivity and the transitivity of the containment relation:

CONT 1          A∈A

CONT 2          A∈B ∧ B∈C → A∈C.

The most fundamental principle for the operator of conceptual conjunction says: “That A contains B and A contains C is the same as that A contains BC” (LLP, 58, fn. 4), that is,

CONJ 1          A∈BC ↔ A∈B ∧ A∈C.

Conjunction then satisfies the following laws:

CONJ 2          AA = A

CONJ 3          AB = BA

CONJ 4          AB∈A

CONJ 5          AB∈B.

The next operator is conceptual negation, ‘not’. Leibniz had serious problems with finding the proper laws governing this operator. From the tradition, he knew little more than the “law of double negation”:

CONJ 1            ~~A = A

One important step towards a complete theory of conceptual negation was to transform the informal principle of contraposition, ‘Every A is B, therefore Every Not-B is Not-A’ into the following principle:

NEG 2            A∈B ↔ ~B∈~A.

Furthermore Leibniz discovered various variants of the “law of consistency”:

NEG 3            A ≠ ~A

NEG 4            A = B → A ≠ ~B.

NEG 5*           A∉~A

NEG 6*           A∈B → A∉~B.

In the GI, these principles are formulated as follows: “A proposition false in itself is ‘A coincides with Not-A’” (§ 11); “If A = B, then A ≠ Not-B” (§ 171); “It is false that B contains Not-B, that is, B doesn’t contain Not-B” (§ 43); and “A is B, therefore A isn’t Not-B” (§ 91).

Principles NEG 5* and NEG 6* have been marked with a ‘*’ in order to indicate that the laws as stated by Leibniz are not absolutely valid but have to be restricted to self-consistent terms:

NEG 5            P(A) → A∉~A

NEG 6            P(A) → (A∈B → A∉~B).

The following two laws describe some characteristic relations between the possibility-operator P and the other operators of L1:

POSS 1           A∈B ∧ P(A) → P(B)

POSS 2           A∈B ↔ ¬P(A~B).

All these principles have been discovered by Leibniz himself who thus provided an almost complete axiomatization of L1. As a matter of fact, the "intensional" algebra of concept can be proven to be equivalent to Boole’s extensional algebra of sets provided that one adds the following counterpart of the “ex contradictorio quodlibet”:

NEG 7            (A~A)∈B.

As regards the relation of conceptual containment, A∈B, it is important to observe that Leibniz’s standard formulation ‘A contains B’ expresses the so-called "intensional" view of concepts as ideas, while we here want to develop an extensional interpretation in terms of the sets of individuals that fall under the concepts. Leibniz explained the mutual relationship between the "intensional" and the extensional point of view in the following passage from the “New Essays on Human understanding”:

The common manner of statement concerns individuals, whereas Aristotle’s refers rather to ideas or universals. For when I say Every man is an animal I mean that all the men are included among all the animals; but at the same time I mean that the idea of animal is included in the idea of man. ‘Animal’ comprises more individuals than ‘man’ does, but ‘man’ comprises more ideas or more attributes: one has more instances, the other more degrees of reality; one has the greater extension, the other the greater intension. (NE, Book IV, ch. XVII, § 8; compare the original French version in GP 5, 469).

If 'Int(A)’ and 'Ext(A)’ abbreviate the "intension" and the extension of a concept A, respectively, then the so-called law of reciprocity can be formalized as follows:

RECI               Int(A) ⊆ Int (B) ↔ Ext(A) ⊇ Ext(B).

From this it immediately follows that two concepts A, B have the same "intension" iff they have the same extension. This somewhat surprising result might seem to unveil an inadequacy of Leibniz’s conception. However, "intensionality" in the sense of traditional logic must not be mixed up with intensionality in the modern sense. Furthermore, in Leibniz’s view, the extension of a concept A is not just the set of actually existing individuals, but rather the set of all possible individuals that fall under concept A. Therefore one may define the concept of an extensional interpretation of L1 in accordance with Leibniz’s ideas as follows:

DEF 4      Let U be a non-empty set (the domain of all possible indi­viduals), and let ϕ be a function such that ϕ(A) ⊆ U for each concept-letter A. Then ϕ is an extensional interpretation of L1 if and only if:

(1) ϕ(A∈B) = true iff ϕ(A) ⊆ ϕ(B);

(2) ϕ(A=B) = true iff ϕ(A) = ϕ(B);

(3) ϕ(AB) = ϕ(A) ∩ ϕ(B);

(4) ϕ(~A) = complement of ϕ(A);

(5) ϕ(P(A)) = true iff ϕ(A) ≠ ∅.

Conditions (1) and (2) are straightforward consequences of RECI. Condition (3) also is trivial since it expresses that an individual x belongs to the extension of AB just in case that x belongs to the extension of both concepts (and hence to their intersection). According to condition (4), the extension of the negative concept ~A is just the set of all individuals which do not fall under the concept A. Condition (5) says that a concept A is possible if and only if it has a non-empty extension.

At first sight, this requirement appears inadequate, since there are certain concepts – such as that of a unicorn – which happen to be empty but which may nevertheless be regarded as possible, that is, not involving a contradiction. However, the universe of discourse underlying the extensional interpretation of L1 does not consist of actually existing objects only, but instead comprises all possible individuals. Therefore the non-emptiness of the extension of A is both necessary and sufficient for guaranteeing the self-consistency of A. Clearly, if A is possible, then there must be at least one possible individual x that falls under concept A.

It has often been noted that Leibniz’s logic of concepts lacks the operator of disjunction. Although this is by and large correct, it doesn’t imply any defect or any incompleteness of the system L1 because the operator A∨B may simply be introduced by definition:

DISJ 1            A∨B =df ~(~A ~B).

On the background of the above axioms of negation and conjunction, the standard laws for disjunction, for example

DISJ 2            A∈(A∨B)

DISJ 3            B∈(A∨B)

DISJ 4            A∈C ∧ B∈C → (A∨B)∈C,

then become provable (Lenzen (1984)).

b. The Quantificational System L2

Leibniz’s quantifier logic L2 emerges from L1 by the introduction of so-called “indefinite concepts”. These concepts are symbolized by letters from the end of the alphabet X, Y, Z ..., and they function as quantifiers ranging over concepts. Thus, in the GI, Leibniz explains:

(16) An affirmative proposition is ‘A is B’ or ‘A contains B’ [...]. That is, if we substitute the value for A, one obtains ‘A coincides with BY’. For example, ‘Man is an animal’, that is, ‘Man’ is the same as ‘a ... animal’ (namely, ‘Man’ is ‘rational animal’). For by the sign ‘Y’ I mean something undetermined, so that ‘BY’ is the same as ‘Some B’, or ‘A ... animal’ [...], or ‘A certain animal’. So ‘A is B’ is the same as ‘A coincides with some B’, that is, ‘A = BY’.

With the help of the modern symbol for the existential quantifier, the latter law can be expressed more precisely as follows:

CONT 3          A∈B ↔ ∃Y(A = BY).

As Leibniz himself noted, the formalization of the UA according to CONT 3 is provably equivalent to the simpler representation according to DEF 2:

It is noteworthy that for ‘A = BY’ one can also say ‘A = AB’ so that there is no need to introduce a new letter. (Cout, 366; compare also LLP, 56, fn. 1.)

On the one hand, according to the rule of existential generalization,

EXIST 1          If α[A], then ∃Yα[Y],

A = AB immediately entails ∃Y(A = YB). On the other hand, if there exists some Y such that A = YB, then according to IDEN 6, AB = YBB, that is, AB = YB and hence (by the premise A = YB) AB = A. (This proof incidentally was given by Leibniz himself in the important paper “Primaria Calculi Logic Fundamenta” of August 1690; Cout, 235).

Next observe that Leibniz often used to formalize the PA ‘Some A is B’ by means of the indefinite concept Y as ‘YA∈B’. In view of CONT 3, this repre­sentation might be transformed into the (elliptic) equation YA = ZB. However, both formalizations are somewhat inadequate because they are easily seen to be theorems of L2! According to CONJ 4, BA contains B, hence by EXIST 1:

CONJ 6          ∃Y(YA∈B).

Similarly, since, according to CONJ 3, AB = BA, a twofold application of EXIST 1 yields:

CONJ 7          ∃Y∃Z(YA = BZ).

These tautologies, of course, cannot adequately represent the PA which for an appropriate choice of concepts A and B may become false! In order to resolve these difficulties, consider a draft of a calculus probably written between 1686 and 1690 (compare Cout, 259-261, and the text-critical edition in AE, VI, 4, # 171), where Leibniz proved principle:

NEG 8*           A∉B ↔ ∃Y(YA∈~B).

On the one hand, it is interesting to see that after first formulating the right hand side of the equivalence, "as usual", in the elliptic way ‘YA is Not-B’, Leibniz later paraphrased it by means of the explicit quantifier expression “there exists a Y such that YA is Not-B”. On the other hand, Leibniz discovered that NEG 8* has to be improved by requiring more exactly that there exists a Y such that YA contains ~B and YA is possible, that is, Y must be compatible with A:

NEG 8            A∉B ↔ ∃Y(P(YA) ∧ YA∈~B).

Leibniz’s proof of this important law is quite remarkable:

(18) […] to say ‘A isn’t B’ is the same as to say ‘there exists a Y such that YA is Not-B’. If ‘A is B’ is false, then ‘A Not-B’ is possible by [POSS 2]. ‘Not-B’ shall be called ‘Y’. Hence YA is possible. Hence YA is Not-B. Therefore we have shown that, if it is false that A is B, then QA is Not-B. Conversely, let us show that if QA is Not-B, ‘A is B’ is false. For if ‘A is B’ would be true, ‘B’ could be substituted for ‘A’ and we would obtain ‘QB is Not-B’ which is absurd. (Cout, 261)

To conclude the sketch of L2, let us consider some of the rare passages where an indefinite concept functions as a universal quantifier. In the above quoted draft (Cout, 260), Leibniz put forward principle “(15) ‘A is B’ is the same as ‘If L is A, it follows that L is B’”:

CONT 4          A∈B ↔ ∀Y(Y∈A → Y∈B).

Furthermore, in § 32 GI, Leibniz at least vaguely recognized that just as A∈B (according to CONJ 6) is equivalent to ∃Y(A = YB), so the negation A∉B means that, for any indefinite concept Y, A ≠ BY:

CONT 5          A∉B ↔ ∀Y(A ≠ YB).

According to AE, VI, 4, 753, Leibniz had written: “(32) Propositio Negativa. A non continet B, seu A esse (continere) B falsum est, seu A non coincidit BY”. Unfortunately, the last passage ‘seu A non coincidit BY’ had been overlooked by Couturat and it is therefore also missing in Parkinson’s translation in LLP! Anyway, with the help of ‘∀’, one can formalize Leibniz’s conception of individual concepts as maximally-consistent concepts as follows:

IND 1             Ind(A) ↔df P(A) ∧ ∀Y(P(AY) → A∈Y).

Thus A is an individual concept iff A is "self-consistent and A contains every concept Y which is compatible with A. The underlying idea of the complete­ness of individual concepts had been formulated in § 72 GI as follows:

So if BY is ["being"], and the indefinite term Y is superfluous, that is, in the way that ‘a certain Alexander the Great’ and ‘Alexander the Great’ are the same, then B is an individual. If the term BA is ["being"] and if B is an individual, then A will be superfluous; or if BA=C, then B=C (LLP 65, § 72 + fn. 1; for a closer interpretation of this idea, see Lenzen (2004c)).

Note, incidentally, that IND 1 might be simplified by requiring that, for each concept Y, A either contains Y or contains ~Y:

IND 2             Ind(A) ↔ ∀Y(A∈~Y ↔ A∉Y).

As a corollary it follows that the invalid principle

NEG 9*          A∉B → A∈~B,

which Leibniz again and again had considered as valid, in fact holds only for individual concepts:

NEG 9            Ind(A) → (A∉B → A∈~B).

Already in the “Calculi Universalis Investigationes” of 1679, Leibniz had pointed out:

…If two propositions are given with exactly the same singular [!] subject, where the predicate of the one is contradictory to the predicate of the other, then necessarily one proposition is true and the other is false. But I say: exactly the same [singular] subject, for example, ‘This gold is a metal’, ‘This gold is a not-metal.’ (AE VI, 4, 217-218).

The crucial issue here is that NEG 9* holds only for an individual concept like, for example, ‘Apostle Peter’, but not for general concepts as, for example, ‘man’. The text-critical apparatus of AE reveals that Leibniz was somewhat diffident about this decisive point. He began to illustrate the above rule by the correct example “if I say ‘Apostle Peter was a Roman bishop’, and ‘Apostle Peter was not a Roman bishop’” and then went on, erroneously, to generalize this law for arbitrary terms: “or if I say ‘Every man is learned’ ‘Every man is not learned’.” Finally he noticed this error “Here it becomes evident that I am mistaken, for this rule is not valid.” The long story of Leibniz’s cardinal mistake of mixing up ‘A isn’t B’ and ‘A is not-B’ is analyzed in detail in Lenzen (1986).

There are many different ways to represent the categorical forms by formulas of L1 or L2. The most straightforward formalization would be the following "homogenous" schema in terms of conceptual containment:

UA   A∈B                                    UN   A∈~B

PA   A∉~B                                  PN   A∉B.

The "homogeneity" consists in two facts:

(a)   The formula for the UN is obtained from that of the UA by replacing the predicate B with its negation, ~B. This is the formal counterpart of the traditional principle of obversion according to which, for example, ‘No A is B’ is equivalent to ‘Every A is not-B’.

(b)  In accordance with the traditional laws of opposition, the formulas for the particular propositions are just taken as the negations of corresponding universal propositions.

In view of DEF 2, the first schema may be transformed into

UA   A = AB                                UN   A = A~B

PA   A ≠ A~B                               PN   A ≠ AB.

Similarly, by means of the fundamental law POSS 2, one obtains

UA   ¬P(A~B)                              UN   ¬P(AB)

PA   P(AB)                                   PN   P(A~B).

Furthermore, with the help of indefinite concepts, one can formulate, for example,

UA   ∃Y(A = YB)                          UN   ∃Y(A = Y~B)

PA   ∀Y(A ≠ Y~B)                        PN   ∀Y(A ≠ YB).

Leibniz used to work with various elements of these representations, often combining them into complicated inhomogeneous schemata such as:

“A = YB           is the UA, where the adjunct Y is like an additional unknown term: ‘Every man’ is the same as ‘A certain animal’.

YA = ZB           is the PA. ‘Some man’ or ‘Man of a certain kind’ is the same as ‘A certain learned’.

A = Y not-B      [is the UN] No man is a stone, that is, Every man is a not-stone, that is, ‘Man’ and ‘A certain not-stone’ coincide.

YA = Z not-B    [is the PN] A certain man isn’t learned or is not-learned, that is, ‘A certain man’ and ‘A certain not-learned’ coincide” (Cout, 233-234).

But the representations of PA and PN of this schema are inadequate because the formulas ‘[∃Y∃Z](YA = ZB)’ and ‘[∃Y∃Z](YA = Z~B)’ are theorems of L2! These conditions may, however, easily be corrected by adding the require­ment that YA is self-consistent:

UA   ∃Y(A = YB)                                  UN   ∃Y(A = Y~B)

PA   ∃Y∃Z(P(YA) ∧ YA = ZB)        PN   ∃Y∃Z(P(YA) ∧ YA = Z~B).

Already in the paper “De Formae Logicae Comprobatione per Linearum ductus”, Leibniz had made numerous attempts to prove the basic laws of syllogistic with the help of these schemata. He continued these efforts in two interesting fragments of August 1690 dealing with “The Primary Bases of a Logical Calculus” (LLP, 90 – 92 + 93-94; compare also the closely related essays “Principia Calculi rationalis” in Cout, 229-231 and the untitled fragments Cout, 259-261 + 261-264). In the end, however, Leibniz remained unsatisfied with his attempts.

To be sure, a complete proof of the theory of the syllogism could easily be obtained by drawing upon the full list of "axioms" for L1 and L2 as stated above. But Leibniz more ambitiously tried to find proofs which presuppose only a small number of "self-evident" laws for identity. In particular, he was not willing to adopt principle

(17) Not-B = not-B not-(AB), that is, Not-B contains Not-AB, or Not-B is not-AB

as a fundamental axiom which therefore needs not itself be demonstrated. Although Leibniz realized that (17) is equivalent to the law of contraposition repeated in the subsequent §

(19) ‘A = AB’ and ‘Not-B = Not-B Not-A’ are equivalent. This is conversion by contraposition (Cout, 422),

he still thought it necessary to prove this "axiom": “This remains to be demonstrated in our calculus”!

c. The Plus-Minus-Calculus

The so-called Plus-Minus-Calculus was mainly developed in the paper “Non inelegans specimen demonstrandi in abstractis” of around 1686/7 (compare GP 7, ## XIX, XX and the text-critical edition in AE VI, 4, ## 177, 178; English translations are provided in LLP, 122-130 + 131-144). Strictly speaking, the Plus-Minus-Calculus is not a logical calculus but rather a much more general calculus which admits of different applications and interpretations. In its abstract form, it should be regarded as a theory of set-theoretical containment, set-theoretical "addition", and set-theoretical "subtraction". Unlike modern systems of set-theory, however, Leibniz’s calculus has no counterpart of the relation ‘x is an element of A’; and it also lacks the operator of set-theoretical "negation", that is, set-theoretical complement! The complement of set A might, though, be defined with the help of the subtraction operator as (U-A) where the constant ‘U’ designates the universe of discourse. But, in Leibniz’s calculus, this additional logical element is lacking.

Leibniz’s drafts exhibit certain inconsistencies which result from the experi­mental character of developing the laws for "real" addition and subtraction in close analogy to the laws of arithmetical addition and subtraction. The genesis of this idea is described in detail in Lenzen (1989). The incon­sistencies might be removed basically in two ways. First, one might restrict A-B to the case where B is contained in A; such a conservative reconstruction of the Plus-Minus-Calculus has been developed in Dürr (1930). The second, more rewarding alternative consists in admitting the operation of "real subtraction" A-B also if B is not contained in A. In any case, however, one has to give up Leibniz’s idea that subtraction might yield "privative" entities which are "less than nothing".

In the following reconstruction, Leibniz’s symbols ‘+’ for the addition (that is, union) and ‘-’ for the subtraction of sets are adopted, while his informal expressions ‘Nothing’ (“nihil”) and ‘is in’ (“est in”) are replaced by the modern symbols ‘∅’ and ‘⊆’. Set-theoretical identity may be treated either as a primitive or as a defined operator. In the former case, inclusion can be defined either by A⊆B =df ∃Y(A+Y = B) or simpler as A⊆B =df (A+B = B). If, conversely, inclusion is taken as primitive, identity can be defined as mutual inclusion: A=B =df (A⊆B) ∧ (B⊆A) (see, for example, Definition 3, Propositions 13 +14 and Proposition 17 in LLP, 131-144).

Set-theoretical addition is symmetric, or, as Leibniz puts it, “transposition makes no difference here” (LLP, 132):

PLUS 1           A+B = B+A.

The main difference between arithmetical addition and "real addition" is that the addition of one and the same "real" thing (or set of things) doesn’t yield anything new:

PLUS 2           A+A = A.

As Leibniz puts it (LLP, 132): “A+A = A […] that is, repetition changes nothing. (For although four coins and another four coins are eight coins, four coins and the same four already counted are not)”.

The "real nothing", that is, the empty set ∅, is characterized as follows: “It does not matter whether Nothing is put or not, that is, A+Nih. = A” (Cout, 267):

NIHIL 1           A+∅ = A.

In view of the relation (A⊆B) ↔ (A+B = B), this law can be transformed into:

NIHIL 2           ∅⊆A.

"Real" subtraction may be regarded as the converse operation of addition: “If the same is put and taken away [...] it coincides with Nothing. That is, A [...] - A [...] = N” (LLP, 124, Axiom 2):

MINUS 1         A-A = ∅.

Leibniz also considered the following principles which in a stronger form express that negation is the converse of addition:

MINUS 2*       (A+B)-B = A

MINUS 3*       (A+B) = C → C-B = A.

But he soon recognized that these laws do not hold in general but only in the special case where the sets A and B are “uncommunicating” (Cout, 267, # 29: “Therefore if A+B = C, then A = C-B […] but it is necessary that A and B have nothing in common”.) The new operator of “communicating” sets has to be understood as follows:

If some term, M, is in A, and the same term is in B, this term is said to be ‘common’ to them, and they will be said to be ‘communicating’. (LLP, 123, Definition 4)

Hence two sets A and B have something in common if and only if there exists some set Y such that Y⊆A and Y⊆B. Now since, trivially, the empty set is included in every set A (NIHIL 2), one has to add the qualification that Y is not empty:

COMMON 1     Com(A,B) ↔df ∃Y(Y≠∅ ∧ Y⊆A ∧ Y⊆B).

The necessary restriction of MINUS 2* and MINUS 3* can then be formalized as follows:

MINUS 2         ¬Com(A,B) → ((A+B)-B = A)

MINUS 3         ¬Com(A,B) ∧ (A+B = C) → (C-B = A).

Similarly, Leibniz recognized (LLP, 130) that from an equation A+B = A+C, A may be subtracted on both sides provided that C is “uncommunicating” both with A and with B, that is,

MINUS 4         ¬Com(A,B) ∧ ¬Com(A,C) → (A+B = A+C → B=C).

Furthermore Leibniz discovered that the implication in MINUS 2 may be converted (and hence strengthened into a biconditional). Thus one obtains the following criterion: Two sets A, B are “uncommunicating” if and only if the result of first adding and then subtracting B coincides with A. Inserting negations on both sides of this equivalence one obtains:

COMMON 2     Com(A,B) ↔ ((A+B)-B) ≠ A.

Whenever two sets A, B are communicating or “have something in common”, the intersection of A and B, in modern symbols A∩B, is not empty (LLP, 127, Case 2 of Theorem IX: “Let us assume meanwhile that E is everything which A and G have in common – if they have something in common, so that if they have nothing in common, E = Nothing”), that is,

COMMON 3     Com(A,B) ↔ A∩B ≠ ∅.

Furthermore, “What has been subtracted and the remainder are un­communicating” (LLP, 128, Theorem X), that is,

COMMON 4     ¬Com(A-B,B).

Leibniz further discovered the following formula which allows one to "calculate" the intersection or “commune” of A and B by a series of additions and subtractions: A∩B = B-((A+B)-A). In a small fragment (Cout, 250) he explained:

Suppose you have A and B and you want to know if there exists some M which is in both of them. Solution: combine those two into one, A+B, which shall be called L […] and from L one of the constituents, A, shall be subtracted […] let the rest be N; then, if N coincides with the other constituent, B, they have nothing in common. But if they do not coincide, they have something in common which can be found by subtracting the rest N [...] from B […] and there remains M, the commune of A and B, which was looked for.

4. Leibniz’s Calculus of Strict Implication

It is a characteristic feature of Leibniz’s logic that when he states and proves the laws of concept logic, he takes the requisite rules and laws of propositional logic for granted. Once the former have been established, however, the latter can be obtained from the former by observing a strict analogy between concepts and propositions which allows one to re-interpret the conceptual connectives as propositional connectives. Note, incidentally, that in the 19th century George Boole in roughly the same way first presupposed propositional logic to develop his algebra of sets, and only afterwards derived the propositional calculus out of the set-theoretical calculus. While Boole thus arrived at the classical, two-valued propositional calculus, Leibniz’s approach instead yields a modal logic of strict implication.

Leibniz outlined a simple, ingenious method to transform the algebra of concepts into an algebra of propositions. Already in the “Notationes Generales” written between 1683 and 1685 (AE VI, 4, # 131), he pointed out to the parallel between the containment relation among concepts and the implication relation among propositions. Just as the simple proposition ‘A is B’ is true, “when the predicate [A] is contained in the subject” B, so a conditional proposition ‘If A is B, then C is D’ is true, “when the consequent is contained in the antecedent” (AE VI, 4, 551). In later works Leibniz compressed this idea into formulations such as “a proposition is true whose predicate is contained in the subject or more generally whose consequent is contained in the antecedent” (Cout, 401). The most detailed explanation of this idea was given in §§ 75, 137 and 189 of the GI:

If, as I hope, I can conceive all propositions as terms, and hypotheticals as categoricals and if I can treat all propositions universally, this promises a wonderful ease in my symbolism and analysis of concepts, and will be a discovery of the greatest importance […]

We have, then, discovered many secrets of great importance for the analysis of all our thoughts and for the discovery and proof of truths. We have discovered [...] how absolute and hypothetical truths have one and the same laws and are contained in the same general theorems […]

Our principles, therefore, will be these [...] Sixth, whatever is said of a term which contains a term can also be said of a proposition from which another proposition follows (LLP, 66, 78, and 85).

To conceive all propositions in analogy to concepts means in particular that the conditional ‘If a then b’ will be logically treated like the containment relation between concepts, ‘A contains B’. Furthermore, as Leibniz explained elsewhere, negations and conjunctions of propositions are to be conceived just as negations and conjunctions of concepts. Thus one obtains the following mapping of the primitive formulas of the algebra of concepts into formulas of the algebra of propositions:

A∈B              α → β

A=B               α ↔ β

~A                 ¬α

AB                 α∧β

P(A)              ◊α

As Leibniz himself explained, the fundamental law POSS 2 does not only hold for the containment-relation between concepts but also for the entailment relation between propositions:

‘A contains B’ is a true proposition if ‘A non-B’ entails a contradiction. This applies both to categorical and to hypothetical propositions (Cout, 407).

Hence A∈B ↔ ¬P(A~B) may be “translated” into (α→β) ↔ ¬◊(α∧¬β). This formula unmistakably shows that Leibniz’s conditional is not a material but rather a strict implication. As Rescher already noted in (1954: 10), Leibniz’s account provides a definition of “entailment in terms of negation, conjunction, and the notion of possibility”, which coincides with the modern definition of strict implication put forward, for example, in Lewis & Langford (1932: 124): “The relation of strict implication can be defined in terms of negation, possibility, and product [...] Thus ‘p implies q’ [...] is to mean ‘It is false that it is possible that p should be true and q false’”. This definition is almost identical with Leibniz’s explanation in “Analysis Particularum”: “Thus if I say ‘If L is true it follows that M is true’, this means that one cannot suppose at the same time that L is true and that M is false” (AE VI, 4, 656).

Given the above “translation”, the basic axioms and theorems of the algebra of concepts can be transformed into the following laws of the algebra of propositions:

IMPL 1            α → α

IMPL 2            (α → β) ∧ (β→γ) → (α→γ)

IMPL 3            (α → β) ↔ (α ↔ α∧β)

CONJ 1          (α → β∧γ) ↔ ((α→β) ∧ (α→γ))

CONJ 2          α∧β → α

CONJ 3          α∧β → β

CONJ 4          α∧α ↔ α

CONJ 5          α∧β ↔ β∧α

NEG 1            ¬¬α ↔ α

NEG 2            ¬(α ↔ ¬α)

NEG 3            (α → β) ↔ (¬β→ ¬α)

NEG 4            ¬α → ¬(α∧β)

NEG 5            ◊α → ((α → β) → ¬(α → ¬β))

NEG 6            (α ∧¬α) → β

POSS 1           (α → β) ∧ ◊α → ◊β

POSS 2           (α → β) ↔ ¬◊(α ∧ ¬β)

POSS 3           ¬◊(α ∧ ¬α)

5. Works on Modal Logic

When people credit Leibniz with having anticipated “Possible-worlds-seman­tics”, they mostly refer to his philosophical writings, in particular to the “Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain” (NE) and to the metaphysical speculations of the “Essais de theodicée” (Theo) of 1710. Leibniz argues there that while there are infinitely many ways how God might have created the world, the real world that God finally decided to create is the best of all possible worlds. As a matter of fact, however, Leibniz has much more to offer than this over-optimistic idea (which was rightly criticized by Voltaire and, for example, in part 2 of chapter 8 of Hume’s “An Enquiry concerning Human Under­standing”). In what follows we briefly consider some of Leibniz’s early logical works where

(1)  the idea that a necessary proposition is true in each possible world (while a possible proposition is true in at least one possible world) is formally elaborated, and where

(2)  the close relation between alethic and deontic modalities is unveiled.

a. Possible-Worlds-Semantics for Alethic Modalities

The fundamental logical relations between necessity, ☐, possibility, ◊, and impossibility can be expressed, for example, by:

NEC 1            ☐(α) ↔ ¬◊(¬α)

NEC 2            ¬◊(α) ↔ ☐(¬α).

These laws were familiar already to logicians long before Leibniz. However, Leibniz "proved" these relations by means of an admirably clear analysis of modal operators in terms of “possible cases”, that is, possible worlds:

Possible is whatever can happen or what is true in some cases

Impossible is whatever cannot happen or what is true        in no […] case

Necessary is whatever cannot not happen or what is true in every […] case

Contingent is whatever can not happen or what is [not] true in some case. (AE VI, 1, 466).

As this quotation shows, Leibniz uses the notion of contingency not in the modern sense of ‘neither necessary nor impossible’ but as the simple negation of ‘necessary’. The quoted analysis of the truth-conditions for modal propositions entails the validity not only of NEC 1, 2, but also of:

NEC 3            ☐α → ◊(α)

NEC 4            ¬◊(α) → ¬(α).

Leibniz "proves" these laws by reducing them to corresponding laws for quantifiers such as: If α is true in each case, then α is true in at least one case. In the “Modalia et Elementa Juris Naturalis” of around 1679, Leibniz mentions NEC 3 and NEC 4 in passing: “Since everything which is necessary is possible, so everything that is impossible is contingent, that is, can fail to happen” (AE IV, 4, 2759). A very elliptic "proof" of these laws was already sketched in the “Elementa juris naturalis” of 1669/70 (AE VI, 1, 469).

It cannot be overlooked, however, that Leibniz’s semi-formal truth conditions, even when combined with his later views on possible worlds, fail to come up to the standards of modern possible worlds semantics, since nothing in Leibniz’s considerations corresponds to an accessibility relation among worlds.

b. Basic Principles of Deontic Logic

As has already been pointed out by Schepers (1972) and Kalinowski (1974), Leibniz saw very clearly that the logical relations between the deontic modalities obligatory, permitted and forbidden exactly mirror the corresponding relations between necessary, possible and impossible, and that therefore all laws and rules of alethic modal logic may be applied to deontic logic as well.

Just like ‘necessary’, ‘contingent’, ‘possible’ and ‘impossible’ are related to each other, so also are ‘obligatory’, ‘not obligatory’, ‘permitted’, and ‘forbidden’ (AE VI, 4, 2762).

This structural analogy goes hand in hand with the important discovery that the deontic notions can be defined by means of the alethic notions plus the additional “logical” constant of a morally perfect man (“vir bonus”). Such a virtuous man is characterized by the requirements that he strictly obeys all laws, always acts in such a way that he does no harm to anybody, and is benevolent to all other people. Given this understanding of a “vir bonus”, Leibniz explains:

Obligatory is what is necessary for the virtuous man as such.

Not obligatory is what is contingent for the virtuous man as such.

Permitted is what is possible for the virtuous man as such.

Forbidden is what is impossible for the virtuous man as such (Grua, 605).

If we express the restriction of the modal operators ☐ and ◊ to the virtuous man by means of a subscript 'v', these definitions can be formalized as follows (where the letter ‘E’ reminding of the German notion ‘erlaubt’ is taken instead of 'P' for 'permitted' in order to avoid confusions with the operator of possibility):

DEON 1          O(α) ↔ ☐v(α)

DEON 2          E(α) ↔ ◊v(α)

DEON 3          F(α) ↔ ¬◊v(α).

Now, as Leibniz mentioned in passing, all that is unconditionally necessary will also be necessary for the virtuous man:

NEC 5             ☐(α) → ☐v(α).

Hence (as was shown in more detail in Lenzen (2005)), Leibniz’s derivation of the fundamental laws for the deontic operators from corresponding laws of the alethic modal operators proceeds in much the same way as the modern reduction of deontic logic to alethic modal logic "rediscovered" almost 300 years after Leibniz by Anderson (1958).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Abbreviations for Leibniz’s works

  • AE       German Academy of Science (ed.), G. W. Leibniz, Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, Series VI, „Philosophische Schriften“, Darmstadt 1930, Berlin 1962 ff.
  • Cout   Louis Couturat (ed.), Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz, Paris (Presses universitaires de France) 1903, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1961.
  • GI      Generales Inquisitiones de Analysi Notionum et Veritatum; first edited in Cout, 356-399; text-critical edition in A, VI 4, 739-788; English trans­lation in LLP, 47-87.
  • GP     C. I. Gerhardt (ed.), Die philosophischen Schriften von G. W. Leibniz, seven volumes Berlin/Halle 1875-90, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1965.
  • Grua   Gaston Grua (ed.), G. W. Leibniz – Textes Inédits, two Volumes, Paris (Presses Universitaires de France) 1948.
  • LH       Eduard Bodemann (ed.), Die Leibniz-Handschriften der Königlichen Öffentlichen Bibliothek zu Hannover, Hannover 1895, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1966.
  • LLP   G. H. R. Parkinson (ed.), Leibniz Logical Papers – A Selection, Oxford (Clarendon Press), 1966.
  • NE      Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain – Par l’Auteur du Système de l’Harmonie Preestablie, in GP 5, 41-509.
  • Theo  Essais de Theodicée sur la Bonté de Dieu, la Liberté de l’Homme et l’Origine du Mal, in GP 6, 21-436.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Anderson, Alan Ross (1958): “A Reduction of Deontic Logic to Alethic Modal Logic”, in Mind LXVII, 100-103.
  • Arnauld, Antoine & Nicole, Pierre (1683) : La Logique ou L’Art de Penser, 5th edition, reprint 1965 Paris (Presses universitaires de France).
  • Burkhardt, Hans (1980): Logik und Semiotik in der Philosophie von Leibniz, München (Philosophia Verlag).
  • Couturat, Louis (1901): La Logique de Leibniz d’après des documents inédits, Paris (Félix Alcan).
  • Dürr, Karl (1930): Neue Beleuchtung einer Theorie von Leibniz - Grundzüge des Logikkalküls, Darmstadt.
  • Euler, Leonhard (1768): Lettres à une princesse d'Allemagne sur quelques sujets de physique et de philosophie, St Petersburg, 1768–1772.
  • Hamilton, William (1861): Lectures on Metaphysics and Logic, ed. by H.L. Mansel & J. Veitch, Edinburgh, London (William Blackwood); reprint Stuttgart Bad Cannstadt 1969.
  • Ishiguro, Hidé (1972): Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language, London (Duckworth).
  • Kalinowski, George (1974): “Un logicien déontique avant la lettre: Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz”, in Archiv für Rechts- und Sozialphilosophie 60, 79-98.
  • Kauppi, Raili (1960): Über die Leibnizsche Logik mit besonderer Berücksichti­gung des Problems der Intension und der Extension, Helsinki (Acta Philosophica Fennica).
  • Kneale, William and Martha (1962): The Development of Logic, Oxford (Clarendon).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1984): “Leibniz und die Boolesche Algebra”, in Studia Leibnitiana 16, 187-203.
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Author Information

Wolfgang Lenzen
University of Osnabrück


clock2Time is what we use a clock to measure. Despite 2,500 years of investigation into the nature of time, many issues about it are unresolved. Here is a list in no particular order of the most important issues that are discussed in this article: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •How time is related to mind; •Why time has an arrow; •Whether the future and past are as real as the present; •How to correctly analyze the metaphor of time’s flow; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth values now; •Whether future time will be infinite; •Whether there was time before our Big Bang; •Whether tensed or tenseless concepts are semantically basic; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Which aspects of time are conventional; and •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges.

Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience compared to our memories of past experiences and our expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. This third theory is called “eternalism.”

Table of Contents

  1. What Should a Philosophical Theory of Time Do?
  2. How Is Time Related to Mind?
  3. What Is Time?
    1. The Variety of Answers
    2. Time vs. “Time”
    3. Linear and Circular Time
    4. The Extent of Time
    5. Does Time Emerge from Something More Basic?
    6. Time and Conventionality
  4. What Does Science Require of Time?
  5. What Kinds of Time Travel are Possible?
  6. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)
  7. Does Time Flow?
    1. McTaggart's A-Series and B-Series
    2. Subjective Flow and Objective Flow
  8. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?
    1. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe
    2. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?
    3. Persist, Endure, Perdure, and Four-Dimensionalism
    4. Truth Values and Free Will
  9. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?
  10. What Gives Time Its Direction or Arrow?
    1. Time without an Arrow
    2. What Needs To Be Explained
    3. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow
    4. Multiple Arrows
    5. Reversing the Arrow
  11. What is Temporal Logic?
  12. Supplements
    1. Frequently Asked Questions
    2. What Science Requires of Time
    3. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)
  13. References and Further Reading

1. What Should a Philosophical Theory of Time Do?

Philosophers of time tend to divide into two broad camps on some of the key philosophical issues, although many philosophers do not fit into these pigeonholes. Members of  the A-camp say that McTaggart's A-series is the fundamental way to view time; events are always changing, the now is objectively real and so is time's flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are semantically basic; and the ontologically fundamental entities are 3-dimensional objects. Members of the B-camp say that McTaggart's B-series is the fundamental way to view time; events are never changing; the now is not objectively real and neither is time's flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are not semantically basic; and the fundamental entities are 4-dimensional events or processes. This article provides an introduction to this controversy between the camps.

However, there are many other issues about time whose solutions do not fit into one or the other of the above two camps. (i) Does time exist only for beings who have minds? (ii) Can time exist if no event is happening anywhere? (iii) What sorts of time travel are possible? (iv) Why does time have an arrow? (v) Is the concept of time inconsistent?

A full theory of time should address this constellation of philosophical issues about time. Narrower theories of time will focus on resolving one or more members of this constellation, but the long-range goal is to knit together these theories into a full, systematic, and detailed theory of time. Philosophers also ask whether to adopt  a realist or anti-realist interpretation of a theory of time, but this article does not explore this subtle metaphysical question.

2. How Is Time Related to Mind?

Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time, by contrast, is indicated by an organism's circadian rhythm or body clock, which is normally regulated by the pattern of sunlight and darkness. Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called phenomenological time, and it is perhaps best understood as awareness of physical time. Psychological time passes relatively swiftly for us while we are enjoying an activity, but it slows dramatically if we are waiting anxiously for the  pot of water to boil on the stove. The slowness is probably due to focusing our attention on short intervals of physical time. Meanwhile, the clock by the stove is measuring physical time and is not affected by any person’s awareness or by any organism's biological time.

When a physicist defines speed to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” refers to physical time, not psychological time or biological time. Physical time is more basic or fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science, but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences.

Psychological time is faster for older people than for children, as you notice when your grandmother says, "Oh, it's my birthday again." That is, an older person's psychological time is faster relative to physical time. Psychological time is slower or faster depending upon where we are in the spectrum of conscious experience: awake normally, involved in a daydream,  sleeping normally, drugged with anesthetics, or in a coma. Some philosophers claim that psychological time is completely transcended in the mental state called nirvana because psychological time slows to a complete stop. There is general agreement among philosophers that, when we are awake normally, we do not experience time as stopping and starting.

A major philosophical problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. Philosophers continue to investigate, but so far do not agree on, how our experience of temporal phenomena produces our consciousness of our experiencing temporal phenomena. With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. Many philosophers also say people in a coma have a low level of consciousness, yet when a person awakes from a coma they can imagine other times but have no good sense about how long they've been in the coma.

We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions.  Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time, with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.

Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we have direct experience of, and which we have only indirect experience of. Is our direct experience of only of the momentary present, as Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or instead do we have direct experience of what William James called a "specious present," a short stretch of physical time? Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, there is continuing controversy about whether the individual specious presents can overlap each other and about how the individual specious presents combine to form our stream of consciousness.

The brain takes an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. For one example, the "time dilation effect" in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. For another example, try tapping your nose with one hand and your knee with your other hand at the same time. Even though it takes longer for the signal from your knee to reach your brain than the signal from your nose to reach your brain, you will have the experience of the two tappings being simultaneous—thanks to the brain's manipulation of the data. Neuroscientists suggest that your brain waits about 80 milliseconds for all the relevant input to come in before you experience a “now.” Craig Callender surveyed the psycho-physics literature on human experience of the present, and concluded that, if the duration in physical time between two experienced events is less than about a quarter of a second (250 milliseconds), then humans will say both events happened simultaneously, and this duration is slightly different for different people but is stable within the experience of any single person. Also, "our impression of subjective present-ness...can be manipulated in a variety of ways" such as by what other sights or sounds are present at nearby times. See (Callender 2003-4, p. 124) and (Callender 2008).

Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the proper time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate, durations (persistence). The most surprising experimental result about our experience of time is Benjamin Libet’s claim in the 1970s that his experiments show that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our choice. Before Libet’s work, it was universally agreed that a person is aware of deciding to act freely, then later the body initiates the action. Libet's work has been used to challenge this universal claim about decisions. However, Libet's own experiments have been difficult to repeat because he drilled through the skull and inserted electrodes to shock the underlying brain tissue. See (Damasio 2002) for more discussion of Libet's experiments.

Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a tall bridge with bungee cords attached to one's ankles; and trying different forms of meditation. So far, none of these avenues have led to success productivity-wise.

Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon? Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds in the world, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? The majority answer is "no." The ability of the concept of time to help us make sense of our phenomenological evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events is a sign that time may be objectively real. Consider succession, that is, order of events in time. We all agree that our memories of events occur after the events occur. If judgments of time were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the ordering of events in time. For example, first Einstein was born, then he went to school, then he died. Everybody agrees that it happened in this order: birth, school, death. No other order. The agreement on time order for so many events, both psychological events and physical events, is part of the reason that most philosophers and scientists believe physical time is an objective and not dependent on being consciously experienced.

Another large part of the reason to believe time is objective is that our universe has so many different processes that bear consistent time relations, or frequency of occurrence relations, to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis is a constant multiple of the frequency of oscillation of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a multiple of the frequency of a vibrating violin string; the relationship of these oscillators does not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of relationships makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is something objective we are referring to with the time-variable in those laws. The stability of these relationships over a long time makes it easy to create clocks. Time can be measured easily because we have access to long-term simple harmonic oscillators that have a regular period or “regular ticking.” This regularity shows up in completely different stable systems: rotations of the Earth, a swinging ball hanging from a string (a pendulum), a bouncing ball hanging from a coiled spring, revolutions of the Earth around the Sun, oscillating electric circuits, and vibrations of a quartz crystal. Many of these systems make good clocks. The existence of these possibilities for clocks strongly suggests that time is objective, and is not merely an aspect of consciousness.

The issue about objectivity vs. subjectivity is related to another issue: realism vs. idealism. Is time real or instead just a useful instrument or just a useful convention or perhaps an arbitrary convention? This issue will appear several times throughout this article, including in the later section on conventionality.

Aristotle raised this issue of the mind-dependence of time when he said, “Whether, if soul (mind) did not exist, time would exist or not, is a question that may fairly be asked; for if there cannot be someone to count there cannot be anything that can be counted…” (Physics, chapter 14). He does not answer his own question because, he says rather profoundly, it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements being numbered were consciousness to exist.

St. Augustine, adopting a subjective view of time, said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality. The 13th century philosophers Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome said time exists in reality as a mind-independent continuum, but is distinguished into earlier and later parts only by the mind. In the 13th century, Duns Scotus clearly recognized both physical and psychological time.

At the end of the 18th century, Kant suggested a subtle relationship between time and mind–that our mind actually structures our perceptions so that we can know a priori that time is like a mathematical line. Time is, on this theory, a form of conscious experience, and our sense of time is a necessary condition of our having experiences such as sensations. In the 19th century, Ernst Mach claimed instead that our sense of time is a simple sensation, not an a priori form of sensation. This controversy took another turn when other philosophers argued that both Kant and Mach were incorrect because our sense of time is, instead, an intellectual construction (see Whitrow 1980, p. 64).

In the 20th century, the philosopher of science Bas van Fraassen described time, including physical time, by saying, “There would be no time were there no beings capable of reason” just as “there would be no food were there no organisms, and no teacups if there were no tea drinkers.”

The controversy in metaphysics between idealism and realism is that, for the idealist, nothing exists independently of the mind. If this controversy is settled in favor of idealism, then physical time, too, would have that subjective feature.

It has been suggested by some philosophers that Einstein’s theory of relativity, when confirmed, showed us that physical time depends on the observer, and thus that physical time is subjective, or dependent on the mind. This error is probably caused by Einstein’s use of the term “observer.” Einstein’s theory implies that the duration of an event depends on the observer’s frame of reference or coordinate system, but what Einstein means by “observer’s frame of reference” is merely a perspective or coordinate framework from which measurements could be made. The “observer” need not have a mind. So, Einstein is not making a point about mind-dependence.

To mention one last issue about the relationship between mind and time, if all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, for example, but would any of these events be in the future? This is a controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and say “whose future?”

For more on the consciousness of time and related issues, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” For more on whether the present, as opposed to time itself, is subjective, see the section called "Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?"

3. What Is Time?

Physical time seems to be objective, whereas psychological time is subjective. Many philosophers of science argue that physical time is more fundamental even though psychological time is discovered first by each of us during our childhood, and even though psychological time was discovered first as we human beings evolved from our animal ancestors. The remainder of this article focuses more on physical time than psychological time.

Time is what we use a clock or calendar to measure. We can say time is composed of all the instants or all the times, but that word "times" is ambiguous and also means measurements of time. Think of our placing a coordinate system on our spacetime (this cannot be done successfully in all spacetimes) as our giving names to spacetime points. The measurements we make of time are numbers variously called times, dates, clock readings, and temporal coordinates; and these numbers are relative to time zones and reference frames and conventional agreements about how to define the second, the conventional unit for measuring time. It is because of what time is that we can succeed in assigning time numbers in this manner. Another feature of time is that we can place all events in a single reference frame into a linear sequence one after the other according to their times of occurrence; for any two instants, they are either simultaneous or else one happens before the other but not vice versa. A third feature is that we can succeed in coherently specifying with real numbers how long an event lasts; this is the duration between the event's beginning instant and its ending instant. These are three key features of time, but they do not quite tell us what time itself is.

In discussion about time, the terminology is often ambiguous. We have just mentioned that care is often not taken in distinguishing time from the measure of time. Here are some additional comments about terminology: A moment is said to be a short time, a short event, and to have a short duration or short interval ("length" of time). Comparing a moment to an instant, a moment is brief, but an instant is even briefer. An instant is usually thought to have either a zero duration or else a duration so short as not to be detectable.

a. The Variety of Answers

We cannot trip over a moment of time nor enclose it in a box, so what exactly are moments? Are they created by humans analogous to how, according to some constructivist philosophers, mathematical objects are created by humans, and once created then they have well-determined properties some of which might be difficult for humans to discover? Or is time more like a Platonic idea? Or is time an emergent feature of changes in analogy to how a sound wave is an emergent features the molecules of a vibrating tuning fork, with no single molecule making a sound? When we know what time is, then we can answer all these questions.

One answer to our question, “What is time?” is that time is whatever the time variable t is denoting in the best-confirmed and most fundamental theories of current science. “Time” is given an implicit definition this way. Nearly all philosophers would agree that we do learn much about physical time by looking at the behavior of the time variable in these theories; but they complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only with a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with.

Physicists often say time is a sequence of moments in a linear order. Presumably a moment is a durationless instant. Michael Dummett’s constructive model of time implies instead that time is a composition of intervals rather than of durationless instants. The model is constructive in the sense that it implies there do not exist any times which are not detectable in principle by a physical process.

One answer to the question "What is time?" is that it is a general feature of the actual changes in the universe so that if all changes are reversed then time itself reverses. This answer is called "relationism" and "relationalism." A competing answer is that time is more like a substance in that it exists independently of relationships among changes or events. These two competing answers to our question are explored in a later section.

A popular post-Einstein answer to "What is time?" is that time is a single dimension of spacetime.

Because time is intimately related to change, the answer to our question is likely to depend on our answer to the question, "What is change?" The most popular type of answer here is that change is an alteration in the properties of some enduring thing, for example, the alteration from green to brown of an enduring leaf. A different type of answer is that change is basically a sequence of states, such as a sequence containing a state in which the leaf is green and a state in which the leaf is brown. This issue won't be pursued here, and the former answer will be presumed at several places later in the article.

Before the creation of Einstein's special theory of relativity, it might have been said that time must provide these four things: (1) For any event, it specifies when it occurs. (2) For any event, it specifies its duration—how long it lasts. (3) For any event, it fixes what other events are simultaneous with it. (4) For any pair of events that are not simultaneous, it specifies which happens first. With the creation of the special theory of relativity in 1905, it was realized that these questions can get different answers in different frames of reference.

Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Zeno, Plato, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart answer the question, “What is time?” by replying that it is nothing because it does not exist (LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993, p. 23). In a similar vein, the early 20th century English philosopher F. H. Bradley argued, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance….The problem of change defies solution.” In the mid-twentieth century, Gödel argued for the unreality of time because Einstein's equations allow for physically possible worlds in which events precede themselves.  In the twenty-first century some physicists such as Julian Barbour say that in order to reconcile general relativity with quantum mechanics either time does not exist or else it is not fundamental in nature; see (Callender 2010) for a discussion of this. However, most philosophers agree that time does exist. They just cannot agree on what it is.

Let’s briefly explore other answers that have been given throughout history to our question, “What is time?” Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12). He never said space is a measure of anything. Aristotle emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time…” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a specific change such as the descent of a leaf can be faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11).

René Descartes had a very different answer to “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation ("Third Meditation" in Meditations on First Philosophy).

In the 17th century, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s linkage between time and change. Barrow said time is something which exists independently of motion or change and which existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Newton argued very specifically that time and space are an infinitely large container for all events, and that the container exists with or without the events. He added that space and time are not material substances, but are like substances in not being dependent on anything except God.

Gottfried Leibniz objected. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had underemphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of any pair of non-simultaneous events. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. He accepted a relational theory of time and rejected a substantival theory.

In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is a form of apprehending phenomena is probably best taken as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only the ability to experience things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space. If physical space and perceptual space are the same thing, then Kant is claiming we know a priori that physical space is Euclidean. With the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 1820s, and with increased doubt about the reliability of Kant’s method of transcendental proof, the view that truths about space and time are a priori truths began to lose favor.

The above discussion does not exhaust all the claims about what time is. And there is no sharp line separating a definition of time, a theory of time, and an explanation of time.

b. Time vs. “Time”

Whatever time is, it is not “time.” “Time” is the most common noun in all documents on the Internet's web pages; time is not. Nevertheless, it might help us understand time if we improved our understanding of the sense of the word “time.” Should the proper answer to the question “What is time?” produce a definition of the word as a means of capturing its sense? No. At least not if the definition must be some analysis that provides a simple paraphrase in all its occurrences. There are just too many varied occurrences of the word: time out, behind the times, in the nick of time, and so forth.

But how about narrowing the goal to a definition of the word “time” in its main sense, the sense that most interests philosophers and physicists? That is, explore the usage of the word “time” in its principal sense as a means of learning what time is. Well, this project would require some consideration of the grammar of the word “time.” Most philosophers today would agree with A. N. Prior who remarked that, “there are genuine metaphysical problems, but I think you have to talk about grammar at least a little bit in order to solve most of them.” However, do we learn enough about what time is when we learn about the grammatical intricacies of the word? John Austin made this point in “A Plea for Excuses,” when he said, if we are using the analytic method, the method of analysis of language, in order to sharpen our perception of the phenomena, then “it is plainly preferable to investigate a field where ordinary language is rich and subtle, as it is in the pressingly practical matter of Excuses, but certainly is not in the matter, say, of Time.” Ordinary-language philosophers have studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein’s expectation is that by drawing attention to ordinary ways of speaking we will be able to dissolve rather than answer our philosophical questions. But most philosophers of time are unsatisfied with this approach; they want the questions answered, not dissolved, although they are happy to have help from the ordinary language philosopher in clearing up misconceptions that may be produced by the way we use the word in our ordinary, non-technical discourse.

c. Linear and Circular Time

Is time more like a straight line or instead more like a circle? If your personal time were circular, then eventually you would be reborn. With circular time, the future is also in the past, and every event occurs before itself. If your time is like this, then the question arises as to whether you would be born an infinite number of times or only once. The argument that you'd be born only once appeals to Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles: each supposedly repeating state of the world would occur just once because each state would not be discernible from the state that recurs. The way to support the idea of eternal recurrence or repeated occurrence seems to be to presuppose a linear ordering in some "hyper" time of all the cycles so that each cycle is discernible from its predecessor because it occurs at a different hyper time.

During history (and long before Einstein made a distinction between proper time and coordinate time), a variety of answers were given to the question of whether time is like a line or, instead, closed like a circle. The concept of linear time first appeared in the writings of the Hebrews and the Zoroastrian Iranians. The Roman writer Seneca also advocated linear time. Plato and most other Greeks and Romans believed time to be motion and believed cosmic motion was cyclical, but this was not envisioned as requiring any detailed endless repetition such as the multiple rebirths of Socrates. However, the Pythagoreans and some Stoic philosophers such as Chrysippus did adopt this drastic position. Circular time was promoted in Ecclesiastes 1:9: "That which has been is what will be, That which is done is what will be done, And there is nothing new under the sun." The idea was picked up again by Nietzsche in 1882. Scholars do not agree on whether Nietzsche meant his idea of circular time to be taken literally or merely for a moral lesson about how you should live your life if you knew that you'd live it over and over.

Many Islamic and Christian theologians adopted the ancient idea that time is linear. Nevertheless, it was not until 1602 that the concept of linear time was more clearly formulated—by the English philosopher Francis Bacon. In 1687, Newton advocated linear time when he represented time mathematically by using a continuous straight line with points being analogous to instants of time. The concept of linear time was promoted by Descartes, Spinoza, Hobbes, Barrow, Newton, Leibniz, Locke and Kant. Kant argued that it is a matter of necessity. In the early 19th century in Europe, the idea of linear time had become dominant in both science and philosophy.

There are many other mathematically possible topologies for time. Time could be linear or closed (circular). Linear time might have a beginning or have no beginning; it might have an ending or no ending. There could be two disconnected time streams, in two parallel worlds; perhaps one would be linear and the other circular. There could be branching time, in which time is like the letter "Y", and there could be a fusion time in which two different time streams are separate for some durations but merge into one for others. Time might be two dimensional instead of one dimensional. For all these topologies, there could be discrete time or, instead, continuous time. That is, the micro-structure of time's instants might be analogous to a sequence of integers or, instead, analogous to a continuum of real numbers. For physicists, if time were discrete or quantized, their favorite lower limit on a possible duration is the Planck time of about 10-43 seconds.

d. The Extent of Time

In ancient Greece, Plato and Aristotle agreed that the past is eternal. Aristotle claimed that time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time.  The reliability of appealing to our imagination to tell us how things are eventually waned. Although Aquinas agreed with Aristotle about the past being eternal, his contemporary St. Bonaventure did not. Martin Luther estimated the world to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E.; Johannes Kepler estimates it to have begun in 4,004 B.C.E; and the Calvinist James Ussher calculated that the world began on Friday, October 28, 4,004 B.C.E. Advances in the science of geology eventually refuted these small estimates for the age of the Earth, and advances in astronomy eventually refuted the idea that the Earth and the universe were created at about the same time.

Physicists generally agree that future time is infinite, but it is an open question whether past time is finite or infinite. Many physicists believe that past time is infinite, but many others believe instead that time began with the Big Bang about 13.8 billion years ago.

In the most well-accepted version of the Big Bang Theory in the field of astrophysics, about 13.8 billion years ago our universe had an almost infinitesimal size and an almost infinite temperature and gravitational field. The universe has been expanding and cooling ever since.

In the more popular version of the Big Bang theory, the Big Bang theory with inflation, the universe once was an extremely tiny bit of explosively inflating material. About 10-36 second later, this inflationary material underwent an accelerating expansion that lasted for 10-30 seconds during which the universe expanded by a factor of 1078. Once this brief period of inflation ended, the volume of the universe was the size of an orange, and the energy causing the inflation was transformed into a dense gas of expanding hot radiation. This expansion has never stopped. But with expansion came cooling, and this allowed individual material particles to condense and eventually much later to clump into stars and galaxies. The mutual gravitational force of the universe’s matter and energy decelerated the expansion, but seven billion years after our Big Bang, the universe’s dark energy became especially influential and started to accelerate the expansion again, despite the mutual gravitational force, although not at the explosive rate of the initial inflation. This more recent inflation of the universe will continue forever at an exponentially accelerating rate, as the remaining matter-energy becomes more and more diluted.

The Big Bang Theory with or without inflation is challenged by other theories such as a cyclic theory in which every trillion years the expansion changes to contraction until the universe becomes infinitesimal, at which time there is a bounce or new Big Bang. The cycles of Bang and Crunch continue forever, and they might or might not have existed forever. For the details, see (Steinhardt 2012). A promising but as yet untested theory called "eternal inflation" implies that our particular Big Bang is one among many other Big Bangs that occurred within a background spacetime that is actually infinite in space and in past time and future time.

Consider this challenging argument from (Newton-Smith 1980, p. 111) that claims time cannot have had a finite past: “As we have reasons for supposing that macroscopic events have causal origins, we have reason to suppose that some prior state of the universe led to the product of [the Big Bang]. So the prospects for ever being warranted in positing a beginning of time are dim.” The usual response to Newton-Smith here is two-fold. First, our Big Bang is a microscopic event, not a macroscopic event, so it might not be relevant that macroscopic events have causal origins. Second, and more importantly, if a confirmed cosmological theory implies there is a first event, we can say this event is an exception to any metaphysical principle that every event has a prior cause.

e. Does Time Emerge from Something More Basic?

Is time a fundamental feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features–in analogy to the way the smoothness of water flow emerges from the complicated behavior of the underlying molecules, none of which is properly called "smooth"? That is, is time ontologically basic (fundamental), or does it depend on something even more basic?

We might rephrase this question more technically by asking whether facts about time supervene on more basic facts. Facts about sound supervene on, or are a product of, facts about changes in the molecules of the air, so molecular change is more basic than sound. Minkowski argued in 1908 that we should believe spacetime is more basic than time, and this argument is generally well accepted. However, is this spacetime itself basic? Some physicists argue that spacetime is the product of some more basic micro-substrate at the level of the Planck length, although there is no agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is, although a leading candidate is quantum information.

Other physicists say space is not basic, but time is. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed this viewpoint:

Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?

The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic or whether the idea of time is basic to concept formation.

f. Time and Conventionality

It is an arbitrary convention that our civilization designs clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time goes on. It is just a matter of convenience that we agree to the convention of re-setting our clock by one hour as we cross a time-zone. It is an arbitrary convention that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of ten, that there are sixty seconds in a minute rather than twelve, that a second lasts as long as it does, and that the origin of our coordinate system for time is associated with the birth of Jesus on some calendars but the entry of Mohammed into Mecca on other calendars.

According to relativity theory, if two events couldn't have had a causal effect on each other, then we analysts are free to choose a reference frame in which one of the events happens first, or instead the other event happens first, or instead the two events are simultaneous. But once a frame is chosen, this fixes the time order of any pair of events. This point is discussed further in the next section.

In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we've invented for our convenience. Because, he said, possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, he recommended the convention of adopting the concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Opposing this conventionalist picture of time, other philosophers of science have recommended a less idealistic view in which time is an objective feature of reality. These philosophers are recommending an objectivist picture of time.

Can our standard clock be inaccurate? Yes, say the objectivists about the standard clock. No, say the conventionalists who say that the standard clock is accurate by convention; if it acts strangely, then all clocks must act strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock that tells everyone the correct time. A closely related question is whether, when we change our standard clock, from being the Earth's rotation to being an atomic clock, or just our standard from one kind of atomic clock to another kind of atomic clock, are we merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense are we making a more correct choice?

Consider how we use a clock to measure how long an event lasts, its duration. We always use the following method: Take the time of the instant at which the event ends, and subtract the time of the instant when the event starts. To find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at 5:00, we subtract and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock should be used? The method of subtracting the start time from the end time is called the "metric" of time. Is there an objective metric, or is time "metrically amorphous," to use a phrase from Adolf Grünbaum, because there are alternatively acceptable metrics, such as subtracting the square roots of those times, or perhaps using the square root of their difference and calling this the "duration"?

There is an ongoing dispute about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time. Einstein said that to define simultaneity in a single reference frame you must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed it must be a convention because there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions since any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967 and D. Malament in 1977 gave different reasons why Einstein is mistaken. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).

4. What Does Science Require of Time?

Physics, including astronomy, is the only science that explicitly studies time, although all sciences use the concept. Yet different physical theories place different demands on this concept. So, let's discuss time from the perspective of current science.

Physical theories treat time as being another dimension, analogous to a spatial dimension, and they describe an event as being located at temporal coordinate t, where t is a real number. Each specific temporal coordinate is called a "time." An instantaneous event is a moment and is located at just one time, or one temporal coordinate, say t1. It is said to last for an "instant." If the event is also a so-called "point event," then it is located at a single spatial coordinate, say <x1, y1, z1>. Locations constitute space, and times constitute time.

The fundamental laws of science do not pick out a present moment or present time. This fact is often surprising to a student who takes a science class and notices all sorts of talk about the present. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the name of the present moment, then calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that t0 is the present is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The laws themselves treat all moments equally.

Science does not require that its theories have symmetry under time-translation, but this is a goal that physicists do pursue for their basic (fundamental) theories. If a theory has symmetry under time-translation, then the laws of the theories do not change. The law of gravitation in the 21st century is the same law that held one thousand centuries ago.

Physics also requires that almost all the basic laws of science to be time symmetric. This means that a law, if it is a basic law, must not distinguish between backward and forward time directions.

In physics we need to speak of one event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds after another. In ordinary discourse outside of science we would never need this kind of precision. The need for this precision has led to requiring time to be a linear continuum, very much like a segment of the real number line. So, one  requirement that relativity, quantum mechanics and the Big Bang theory place on any duration is that is be a continuum. This implies that time is not quantized, even in quantum mechanics. In a world with time being a continuum, we cannot speak of some event being caused by the state of the world at the immediately preceding instant because there is no immediately preceding instant, just as there is no real number immediately preceding pi.

EinsteinEinstein's theory of relativity has had the biggest impact on our understanding of time. But Einstein was not the first physicist to appreciate the relativity of motion. Galileo and Newton would have said speed is relative to reference frame. Einstein would agree but would add that durations and occurrence times are also relative. For example, any observer fixed to a moving railroad car in which you are seated will say your speed is zero, whereas an observer fixed to the train station will say you have a positive speed. But as Galileo and Newton understood relativity, both observers will agree about the time you had lunch on the train. Einstein would say they are making a mistake about your lunchtime; they should disagree about when you had lunch. For Newton, the speed of anything, including light, would be different in the two frames that move relative to each other, but Einstein said Maxwell’s equations require the speed of light to be invariant. This implies that the Galilean equations of motion are incorrect. Einstein figured out how to change the equations; the consequence is the Lorentz transformations in which two observers in relative motion will have to disagree also about the durations and occurrence times of events. What is happening here is that Einstein is requiring a mixing of space and time; Minkowski said it follows that there is a spacetime which divides into its space and time differently for different observers.

One consequence of this is that relativity's spacetime is more fundamental than either space or time alone. Spacetime is commonly said to be four-dimensional, but because time is not space it is more accurate to think of spacetime as being (3 + 1)-dimensional. Time is a distinguished, linear subspace of four-dimensional spacetime.

Time is relative in the sense that the duration of an event depends on the reference frame used in measuring the duration. Specifying that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is like asking someone to stand over there and not giving any indication of where “there” is. One implication of this is that it becomes more difficult to defend McTaggart's A-theory which says that properties of events such as "happened twenty-three minutes ago" and "is happening now" are basic properties of events and are not properties relative to chosen reference frames.

Another profound idea from relativity theory is that accurate clocks do not tick the same for everyone everywhere. Each object has its own proper time, and so the correct time shown by a clock depends on its history (in particular, it history of speed and gravitational influence).  Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion run slower, as do clocks in stronger gravitational fields. In general, two synchronized clocks do not stay synchronized if they move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Clocks in cars driving by your apartment building run slower than your apartment’s clock.

Suppose there are two twins. One stays on Earth while the other twin zooms away in a spaceship and returns ten years later according to the spaceship’s clock. That same arrival event could be twenty years later according to an Earth-based clock, provided the spaceship went fast enough. The Earth twin would now be ten years older than the spaceship twin. So, one could say that the Earth twin lived two seconds for every one second of the spaceship twin.

According to relativity theory, the order of events in time is only a partial order because for any event e, there is an event f such that e need not occur before f, simultaneous with f, nor after f.  These pairs of events are said to be in each others’ “absolute elsewhere,” which is another way of saying that neither could causally affect each other because even a light signal could not reach from one event to the other. Adding a coordinate system or reference frame to spacetime will force the events in all these pairs to have an order and so force the set of all events to be totally ordered in time, but what is interesting philosophically is that there is a leeway in the choice of the frame. For any two specific events e and f that could never causally affect each other, the analyst may choose a frame in which e occurs first, or choose another frame in which f occurs first, or instead choose another frame in which they are simultaneous. Any choice of frame will be correct. Such is the surprising nature of time according to relativity theory.

General relativity places other requirements on events that are not required in special relativity. Unlike in Newton's physics and the physics of special relativity, in general relativity the spacetime is not a passive container for events; it is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature of spacetime itself. Gravity is a manifestation of the warping of spacetime. In special relativity, its Minkowski spacetime has no curvature. In general relativity a spacetime with no mass or energy might or might not have curvature, so the geometry of spacetime is not always determined by the behavior of matter and energy.

In 1611, Bishop James Ussher declared that the beginning of time occurred on October 23, 4004 B.C.E. Today's science disagrees. According to one interpretation of the Big Bang theory of cosmology, the universe began 13.8 billion years ago as spacetime started to expand from an infinitesimal volume; and the expansion continues today, with the volume of space now doubling in size about every ten billion years. The amount of future time  is a potential infinity (in Aristotle's sense of the term) as opposed to an actual infinity. For more discussion of all these compressed remarks, see What Science Requires of Time.

5. What Kinds of Time Travel are Possible?

Most scientists and philosophers of time agree that there is good evidence that human time travel has occurred. To explain, let’s first define the term. We mean physical time travel, not travel by wishing or dreaming or sitting still and letting time march on. In any case of physical time travel the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.

The physical possibility of human travel to the future is well accepted, but travel to the past is more controversial, and time travel that changes either the future or the past is generally considered to be impossible. Our understanding of time travel comes mostly from the implications of Einstein’s general theory of relativity. This theory has never failed any of its many experimental tests, so we trust its implications for human time travel.

Einstein’s general theory of relativity permits two kinds of future time travel—either by moving at high speed or by taking advantage of the presence of an intense gravitational field. Let's consider just the time travel due to high speed. Actually any motion produces time travel (relative to the clocks of those who do not travel), but if  you move at extremely high speed, the time travel is more noticeable; you can travel into the future to the year 2,300 on Earth (as measured by clocks fixed to the Earth) while your personal clock measures that merely, let’s say, ten years have elapsed. You can participate in that future, not just view it. You can meet your twin sister’s descendants. But you cannot get back to the twenty-first century on Earth by reversing your velocity. If you get back, it will be via some other way.

It's not that you suddenly jump into the Earth's future of the year 2,300. Instead you have continually been traveling forward in both your personal time and the Earth’s external time, and you could have been continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage.

How about travel to the past, the more interesting kind of time travel? This is not allowed by either Newton's physics or Einstein's special relativity, but is allowed by general relativity. In 1949, Kurt Gödel surprised Albert Einstein by discovering that in some unusual worlds that obey the equations of general relativity—but not in the actual world—you can continually travel forward in your personal time but eventually arrive into your own past.

Unfortunately, say many philosophers and scientists, even if you can travel to the past in the actual world you cannot do anything that has not already been done, or else there would be a contradiction. In fact, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your childhood self, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You can kill yourself, but you won’t because you didn’t. While attempting to kill yourself, you will be in two different bodies at the same time.

Here are a variety of philosophical arguments against past-directed time travel.

  1. If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is ridiculous.
  2. If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
  3. Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has encountered any time travelers.
  4. If past time travel were possible, criminals could avoid their future arrest by traveling back in time, but that is absurd, so time travel is, too.
  5. If there were time travel, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always botch their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there is no time travel.
  6. Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. Buy a copy of Darwin's book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. In the 21st century, enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Neither you nor Darwin. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn't really possible.
  7. The philosopher John Earman describes a rocket ship that carries a time machine capable of firing a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past. The ship is programmed to fire the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the “return” or “impending arrival” of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched. However, the argument of Earman’s Paradox depends on the assumptions that the rocket ship does work as intended—that people are able to build the computer program, the probe, the safety switch, and an effective sensing device. Earman himself says all these premises are acceptable and so the only weak point in the reasoning to the paradoxical conclusion is the assumption that travel to the past is physically possible. There is an alternative solution to Earman’s Paradox. Nature conspires to prevent the design of the rocket ship just as it conspires to prevent anyone from building a gun that shoots if and only if it does not shoot. We cannot say what part of the gun is the obstacle, and we cannot say what part of Earman’s rocket ship is the obstacle.

These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, that it is not physically possible, that it is not technologically possible with current technology, and that it is unlikely, given today's empirical evidence.

For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”

6. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)

By "time requires change," we mean that for time to exist something must change its properties over time. We don't mean, change it properties over space as in change color from top to bottom. There are two main philosophical theories about whether time requires change, relational theories and substantival theories.

In a relational theory of time, time is defined in terms of relationships among objects, in particular their changes. Substantival theories are theories that imply time is substance-like in that it exists independently of changes; it exists independently of all the spacetime relations exhibited by physical processes. This theory allows "empty time" in which nothing changes. On the other hand, relational theories do not allow this. They imply that at every time something is happening—such as an electron moving through space or a tree leaf changing its color. In short, no change implies no time. Some substantival theories describe spacetime as being like a container for events. The container exists with or without events in it. Relational theories imply there is no container without contents. But the substance that substantivalists have in mind is more like a medium pervading all of spacetime and less like an external container. The vast majority of relationists present their relational theories in terms of actually instantiated relations and not merely possible relations.

Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, because we measure time by observing changes in some property or other, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. On this issue, we need to be clear about what sense of change and what sense of property we are intending. For the relational theory, the term "property" is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. Then the world’s chlorophyll undergoes a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to this by saying that change in chlorophyll's grue property is not a “real change” in the world’s chlorophyll.

Does Queen Anne’s death change when I forget about it? Yes, but the debate here is whether the event’s intrinsic properties can change, not merely its non-intrinsic properties such as its relationships to us. This special intrinsic change is called by many names: secondary change and second-order change and McTaggartian change and McTaggart change. Second-order change is the kind of change that A-theorists say occurs when Queen Anne's death recedes ever farther into the past. The objection from the B-theorists here is that this is not a "real, objective, intrinsic change" in her death. First-order change is ordinary change, the kind that occurs when a leaf changes from green to brown, or a person changes from sitting to standing.

Einstein's general theory of relativity does imply it is possible for spacetime to exist while empty of events. This empty time is permissible according to the substantival theory but not allowed by the relational theory. Yet Einstein considered himself to be a relationalist.

Substantival theories are sometimes called "absolute theories." Unfortunately the term "absolute theory" is used in two other ways. A second sense of " to be absolute" is to be immutable,  or changeless. A third sense is to be independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies there is no absolute time in the sense of being independent of reference frame, it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines absolute time in the sense of substantival time; Einstein believed it did, but many philosophers of science do not.

The first advocate of a relational theory of time was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change.” (Physics, book IV, chapter 11, page 218b) However, the battle lines were most clearly drawn in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for the relational position against Newton, who had adopted a substantival theory of time. Leibniz’s principal argument against Newton is a reductio ad absurdum. Suppose Newton’s space and time were to exist. But one could then imagine a universe just like ours except with everything shifted five kilometers east and five minutes earlier. However, there would be no reason why this shifted universe does not exist and ours does. Now we have arrived at a contradiction because, if there is no reason for there to be our universe rather than the shifted universe, then we have violated Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason: that there is an understandable reason for everything being the way it is. So, by reductio ad absurdum, Newton’s substantival space and time do not exist. In short, the trouble with Newton’s theory is that it leads to too many unnecessary possibilities.

Newton offered this two-part response: (1) Leibniz is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason regarding the rational intelligibility of the universe, but there do not have to be knowable reasons for humans; God might have had His own sufficient reason for creating the universe at a given place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons. (2) The bucket thought-experiment shows that acceleration relative to absolute space is detectable; thus absolute space is real, and if absolute space is real, so is absolute time. Here's how to detect absolute space. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, and let it come to equilibrium. Notice that there is no relative motion between the bucket and the water, and in this case the water surface is flat. Now spin the bucket, and keep doing this until the angular velocity of the water and the bucket are the same. In this second case there is again no relative motion between the bucket and the water, but now the water surface is concave. So spinning makes a difference, but how can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the surface? It cannot, says Newton. When the bucket and water are spinning, what are they spinning relative to? Because we can disregard the rest of the environment including the tree and rope, says Newton, the only explanation of the difference in surface shape between the non-spinning case and the spinning case is that when it is not spinning there is no motion relative to space, but when it is spinning there is motion relative to a third thing, space itself, and space itself is acting upon the water surface to make it concave. Alternatively expressed, the key idea is that the presence of centrifugal force is a sign of rotation relative to absolute space. Leibniz had no rebuttal. So, for over two centuries after this argument was created, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.

One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. In a space containing only a single glove, said Kant, Leibniz could not account for its being a right-handed glove versus a left-handed glove because all the internal relationships would be the same in either case. However, we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory is better than the relational theory.

Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Huygens, Berkeley, and Mach had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz. Mach argued that it must be the remaining matter in the universe, such as the "fixed" stars, which causes the water surface in the bucket to be concave, and that without these stars or other matter, a spinning bucket would have a flat surface. In the 20th century, Hans Reichenbach and the early Einstein declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for the relational theory, in large part because a Newtonian absolute space would be undetectable. Special relativity, they also said, ruled out a space-filling ether, the leading candidate for substantival space, so the substantival theory was incorrect. And the response to Newton’s bucket argument is to note Newton’s error in not considering the environment. Einstein agreed with Mach that, if you hold the bucket still but spin the background stars  in the environment, then the water will creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface—so the bucket thought experiment does not require absolute space.

Although it was initially believed by Einstein and Reichenbach that relativity theory supported Mach regarding the bucket experiment and the absence of absolute space, this belief is controversial. Many philosophers argue that Reichenbach and the early Einstein have been overstating the amount of metaphysics that can be extracted from the physics.  There is substantival in the sense of independent of reference frame and substantival in the sense of independent of events. Isn't only the first sense ruled out when we reject a space-filling ether? The critics admit that general relativity does show that the curvature of spacetime is affected by the distribution of matter, so today it is no longer plausible for a substantivalist to assert that the “container” is independent of the behavior of the matter it contains. But, so they argue, general relativity does not rule out a more sophisticated substantival theory in which spacetime exists even if it is empty and in which two empty universes could differ in the curvature of their spacetime. For this reason, by the end of the 20th century, substantival theories had gained some ground.

In 1969, Sydney Shoemaker presented an argument attempting to establish the understandability of time existing without change, as Newton’s absolutism requires. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. In region 3, change ceases every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year. Every sixty years, that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years, all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. In year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, time having marched on for a year with no change. Note that even if Shoemaker’s scenario successfully shows that the notion of empty time is understandable, it does not show that empty time actually exists. If we accept that empty time occasionally exists, then someone who claims the tick of the clock lasts one second could be challenged by a skeptic who says perhaps empty time periods occur randomly and this supposed one-second duration contains three changeless intervals each lasting one billion years, so the duration is really three billion and one second rather than one second. However, we usually prefer the simpler of two competing hypotheses.

Empty time isn't directly detectable by those who are frozen, but it may be indirectly detectable, perhaps in the manner described by Shoemaker or by signs in advance of the freeze:

Suppose that immediately prior to the beginning of a local freeze there is a period of "sluggishness" during which the inhabitants of the region find that it makes more than the usual amount of effort for them to move the limbs of their bodies, and we can suppose that the length of this period of sluggishness is found to be correlated with the length of the freeze. (Shoemaker 1969, p. 374)

Is the ending of the freeze causeless, or does something cause the freeze to end? Perhaps the empty time itself causes the freeze to end. Yet if a period of empty time, a period of "mere" passage of time, is somehow able to cause something, then, argues Ruth Barcan Marcus, it is not clear that empty time can be dismissed as not being genuine change. (Shoemaker 1969, p. 380)

7. Does Time Flow?

Time seems to flow or pass in the sense that future events become present events and then become past events, just like a runner who passes us by and then recedes farther and farther from us.  In 1938, the philosopher George Santayana offered this description of the flow of time: “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” The converse image of time's flowing past us is our advancing through time. Time definitely seems to flow, but there is philosophical disagreement about whether it really does flow, or pass. Is the flow objectively real? The dispute is related to the dispute about whether McTaggart's A-series or B-series is more fundamental.

a. McTaggart's A-Series and B-Series

In 1908, the philosopher J. M. E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time by placing them into a series according to the times at which they occur. But this ordering can be created in two ways, an A way and a B way. Consider two past events a and b, in which b is the most recent of the two. In McTaggart's B-series, event a happens before event b in the series because the time of occurrence of event a is less than the time of occurrence of event b. But when ordering the same events into McTaggart's A-series, event a happens before event b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b. Both series produce exactly the same ordering of events. Here is a picture of the ordering. c is another event that happens after a and b.


There are many other events that are located within the series at event a's location, namely all events simultaneous with event a. If we were to consider an instant of time to be a set of simultaneous events, then instants of time are also linearly ordered into an A-series and a B-series. McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical [for reasons that will not be explored in this article], but McTaggart also believed the A-properties such as being past are essential to our current concept of time, so for this reason he believed our current concept of time is incoherent.

Let's suppose that event c occurs in our present after events a and b. The information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series. However, the information that c is in the present is used to create the A-series; it is what tells us to place c to the right of b. That information is not used to create the B-series.

Metaphysicians dispute whether the A-theory or instead the B-theory is the correct theory of reality. The A-theory comprises two theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory: (1) Time is constituted by an A-series in which any event's being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself and not merely a subjective relation between the event and us who exist. (2) The second thesis of the A-theory is that events change. In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:

Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes.... But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.

This special change is called secondary change and second-order change and also McTaggartian change.

The B-theory disagrees with both thesis (1) and thesis (2) of the A-theory. According to the B-theory, the B-series and not the A-series is fundamental; fundamental temporal properties are relational; McTaggartian change is not an objective change and so is not metaphysically basic or ultimately real. The B-theory implies that an event's property of occurring in the past (or occurring twenty-three minutes ago, or now, or in a future century) is merely a subjective relation between the event and us because, when analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Here is how it is subjective, according to the B-theory. Queen Anne's death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past as opposed to, say, Aristotle's past; and it occurs in our past rather than our present or our future because it occurs at a time that is less than the time of occurrence of some event that we (rather than Aristotle) would say is occurring.  The B-theory is committed to there being no objective distinction among past, present and future. Both the A-theory and B-theory agree, however, that it would be a mistake to say of some event that it happens on a certain date but then later it fails to happen on that date.

The B-theorists complain that thesis (1) of the A-theory implies that an event’s being in the present is an intrinsic property of that event, so it implies that there is an absolute, global present for all of us. The B-theorist points out that according to Einstein’s Special Theory of Relativity there is no global present. An event can be in the present for you and not in the present for me. An event can be present in a reference frame in which you are a fixed observer, but if you are moving relative to me, then that same event will not be present in a reference frame in which I am a fixed observer. So, being present is not a property of an event, as the A theory implies. According to relativity theory, what is a property of an event is being present in a chosen reference frame, and this implies that being present is relative to us who are making the choice of reference frame.

When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of

    • A-series and B-series, of
    • A-theory and B-theory, of
    • A-facts and B-facts, of
    • A-terms and B-terms, of
    • A-properties and B-properties, of
    • A-predicates and B-predicates, of
    • A-statements and B-statements, and of the
    • A-camp and B-camp.

Here are some examples. Typical B-series terms are relational; they are relations between events: "earlier than," "happens twenty-three minutes after," and "simultaneous with." Typical A-theory terms are monadic, they are one-place qualities of events: "the near future," "twenty-three minutes ago," and "present." The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties. The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon won’t be a fact. Similarly the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago will, if true, soon become false. However, B-facts are not transitory, and B-statements have fixed truth values. For the B-theorist, the statement "Event a occurs an hour before b" will, if true, never become false. The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist appeals instead to B-facts, insofar as one accepts facts into one’s ontology, which is metaphysically controversial. According to the B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says "It began snowing twenty-three minutes ago," what really makes it true isn't the A-fact that the event of the snow's beginning has twenty-three minutes of pastness; what makes it true is that the event of uttering the sentence occurs twenty-three minutes after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that "occurs ... after" is a B-term. Those persons in the A-camp and B-camp recognize that in ordinary speech we are not careful to use one of the two kinds of terminology, but each camp believes that it can best explain the terminology of the other camp in its own terms.

b. Subjective Flow and Objective Flow

There are two primary theories about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) the flow is a myth or else is merely subjective. Often theory A is called the dynamic theory or the A-theory while theory B  is called the static theory or B-theory.

The static theory implies that the flow is an illusion, the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of the theory goes something like this. Time exists, things change, but time does not change by flowing. The present does not move. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience. There is some objective feature of our brains that causes us to believe we are experiencing a flow of time, such as the fact that we have different perceptions at different times and the fact that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences; but the flow itself is not objective. This kind of theory of time's flow is often characterized as a myth-of-passage theory. The myth-of-passage theory is more likely to be adopted by those who believe in McTaggart’s B-theory. One point offered in favor of the myth-of-passage theory is to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly. One second divided by one second is the number one. That’s not a coherent rate. There are other arguments, but these won't be explored here.

Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term "flow." This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. That is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers normally use when debating the objectivity of time's flow.

There is another uncontroversial sense of flow—when physicists say that time flows differently for the two twins in Einstein's twin paradox. All the physicists mean here is that time is different in different reference frames that are moving relative to each other; they need not be promoting the dynamic theory over the static theory.

Physicists sometimes carelessly speak of time flowing in yet another sense—when what they mean is that time has an arrow, a direction from the past to the future. But again this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers use when speaking of the dynamic theory of time's flow.

There is no doubt that time seems to pass, so a B-theorist might say the flow is subjectively real but not objectively real. There surely is some objective feature of our brains, say the critics of the dynamic theories, that causes us to mistakenly believe we are experiencing a flow of time, such as the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences, but the flow itself is not objectively real.

According to the dynamic theories, the flow of time is objective, a feature of our mind-independent reality. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart's A-series is a fundamental feature of time but his B-series is not.

One dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past, and they also change in their degree of pastness and degree of presentness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart's second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change as when a leaf changes from a green state to a brown state. For the B-theorist the only proper kind of change is when different states of affairs obtain at different times.

A second dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as “temporal becoming.”

Opponents of these two dynamic theories complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. For example, saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval does not count as an objectively real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change from present to past or from indeterminate to determinate. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”

A third dynamic theory says time's flow is the coming into existence of facts, the actualization of new states of affairs; but, unlike the first two dynamic theories, there is no commitment to events changing. This is the theory of flow that is usually accepted by advocates of presentism.

A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false on today’s sunny day. That's an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth value changes are at the root of the flow. In response, critics suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If it cannot have a truth value, it cannot change its truth value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth value, the sentence with the temp0ral indexical replaced by the date that refers to a specific time and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2007, and the speaker is in Sacramento, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately related to the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2007 in Sacramento, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, complete sentences have truth values, and these truth values do not change with time so they do not underlie any flow of time. Fully-described events do not change their properties and so time does not flow because complete or "eternal" sentences do not change their truth values.

Among B-theorists, Hans Reichenbach has argued that the flow of time is produced by the collapse of the quantum mechanical wave function. Another dynamic theory is promoted by advocates of the B-theory who add to the block-universe  a flowing present which "spotlights" the block at a particular slice at any time. This is often called the moving spotlight view.

John Norton (Norton 2010) argues that time's flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour.” (Maudlin 2007, p. 112)

Regardless of how we analyze the metaphor of time’s flow, it flows in the direction of the future, the direction of the arrow of time, and we need to analyze this metaphor of time's arrow.

8. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?

a. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism and the Block-Universe

Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on the question of the reality of the past, present, and future. (1): According to presentism, if something is real, then it is real now; all and only things that exist now are real. The presentist maintains that the past and the future are not real, so if a statement about the past is true, this must be because some present facts make it true. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, A. N. Prior, and Ned Markosian are presentists. Presentists belong in the A-camp because presentism implies that being present is an intrinsic property of an event; it's a property that the event has independent of our being alive now.

(2): Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presents that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C. D. Broad, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley have defended this view. They claim the past and present are real, but the future is not real. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see (Putnam 1967), p. 244 for commentary.

(3): Proponents of eternalism oppose presentism and the growing-past theory. Bertrand Russell, J. J. C. Smart, W. V. O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and Paul Horwich object to assigning special ontological status to the past, the present, or the future. Advocates of eternalism do not deny the reality of the events that we classify as being in our past, present or future, but they say there is no objective ontological difference among the past, the present, and the future, just as there is no objective ontological difference among here, there, and far. Yes, we thank goodness that the threat to our safety is there rather than here, and that it is past rather than present, but these differences are subjective, being dependent on our point of view. The classification of events into past, or present, or future is a subjective classification, not an objective one.

Presentism is one of the theories in the A‐camp because it presumes that being present is an objective property that events have.

Eternalism, on the other hand, is closely associated with the block-universe theory as is four-dimensionalism. Four-dimensionalism implies that the ontologically basic (that is, fundamental) objects in the universe are four-dimensional rather than three-dimensional. Here, time is treated as being somewhat like a fourth dimension of space, though strictly speaking time is not a dimension of space. On the block theory, time is like a very special extra dimension of space, as in a Minkowski diagram, and for this reason the block theory is said to promote the spatialization of time. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large along those dimensions.

The block-universe theory implies that reality is a single block of spacetime with its time slices (planes of simultaneous events) ordered by the happens-before relation. Four-dimensionalism adds that every object that lasts longer than an instant is in fact a four-dimensional object with an infinite number of time-slices or temporal parts. Adults are composed of their infancy time-slices, plus their childhood time-slices, plus their teenage time-slices, and so forth.

The block itself has no distinguished past, present, and future, but any chosen reference frame has its own past, present, and future. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. William James coined the term “block-universe.” The growing-past theory is also called the growing-block theory.

All three ontologies about the past, present, and future agree that we only ever experience the present. One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated? Some presentists will say what makes it true are only features of the present way things are. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist believes this is to say something true of an existing Abraham Lincoln who is also a non-present thing.

A second issue for the presentist is to account for causation, for the fact that April showers caused May flowers. When causes occur, their effects are not yet present. A survey of defenses of presentism can be found in (Markosian 2003), but opponents of presentism need to be careful not to beg the question.

The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past will usually unite in opposition to eternalism on three grounds: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are memories of past experiences and expectations of future experiences. (No one can stand outside time and compare the vividness of present experience with the vividness of future experience and past experience.) (ii)  Eternalism misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the block-universe, which is the ontological theory promoted by most eternalists, there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already, but we know this determinsm and its denial of free will is incorrect. (iii) A present event "moves" in the sense that a moment later it is no longer present, having lost its property of presentness.

The counter from the defenders of eternalism and the block-universe is that, regarding (i), the now is significant but not objectively real. Regarding (ii) and the open future,  the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block. Finally, don't we all fear impending doom? But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the doom is known not to exist? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future and past danger be so mysterious.

The advocates of the block-universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block-universe can make sense of the special theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are separated but in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future, yet this implies that advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the eternalists. Two key assumptions of the block theory here are, first, that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and, second, that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other.

Opponents of the block-universe counter that block theory does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because the block theory considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality, yet the present is known to be part of objective reality. If science doesn't use the concept of the present in its basic laws, then this is one of science's faults. For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism, and for criticisms of the block theory, see (Putnam 1967) and (Saunders 2002).

b. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?

A calendar does not tell us which day is the present day. The calendar leaves out the "now." All philosophers agree that we would be missing some important information if we did not know what time it is now, but these philosophers disagree over just what sort of information this is. Proponents of the objectivity of the present are committed to claiming the universe would have a present even if there were no conscious beings. This claim is controversial. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:

In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later. (Russell 1915, p. 212)

The debate about whether the present is objectively real is intimately related to the metaphysical dispute between McTaggart's A-theory and B-theory. The B-theory implies that the present is either non-existent or else mind-dependent, whereas the A-theory does not. The principal argument for believing in the objectivity of the now is that the now is so vivid to everyone; the present stands out specially among all times. If science doesn't explain this vividness, then there is a defect within science. A second argument points out that there is so much agreement among people around us about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn't that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective, and existent rather than non-existent? A third argument for objectivity of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. Notice all the present-tensed terminology in the English language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.

One criticism of the first argument, the argument from vividness, is that the now is vivid but so is the "here," yet we don't conclude from this that the here is somehow objective geographically. Why then assume that the vividness of the now points to it being objective temporally? A second criticism is that we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with experience now of future time and past times. What is being compared when we speak of "vividness" is our present experience with our memories and expectations.

A third criticism of the first argument regarding vividness points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer tells us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.

According to McTaggart's A-camp, there is a global now shared by all of us. The B-camp disagrees and says this belief is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now; we are not factoring in the finite speed of light. Proponents of the subjectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases "the present" and "now" as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered or written by the speaker, so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present. The main positive argument for subjectivity, and against the A-camp, appeals to the relativity of simultaneity, a feature of Einstein's Special Theory of Relativity of 1905. The argument points out that in this theory there is a block of space-time in which past events are separated from future events by a plane or "time slice" of simultaneous, presently-occurring instantaneous events, but this time slice is different in different reference frames. For example, take a reference frame in which you and I are not moving relative to each other; then we will easily agree on what is happening now—that is, on the 'now' slice of spacetime—because our clocks tick at the same rate. Not so for someone moving relative to us. If that other person is far enough away from us (that any causal influence of Beethoven's death couldn't have reached that person) and is moving fast enough away from us, then that person might truly say that Beethoven's death is occurring now! Yet if that person were moving rapidly towards us, they might truly say that our future death is happening now. Because the present is frame relative, the A-camp proponent of an objective now must select a frame and thus one of these different planes of simultaneous events as being "what's really happening now," but surely any such choice is just arbitrary, or so Einstein would say. Therefore, if we aren't going to reject Einstein's interpretation of his theory of special relativity, then we should reject the objectivity of the now. Instead we should think of every event as having its own past and future, with its present being all events that are simultaneous with it. For further discussion of this issue see (Butterfield 1984).

There are interesting issues about the now even in theology. Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and so must always be changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God's being omniscient and God's being immutable.

c. Persist, Endure, Perdure, and Four-Dimensionalism

Some objects last longer than others. They persist longer. But there is philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to persist by perduring rather than enduring. Think of events and processes as being four-dimensional. The more familiar three-dimensional objects such as chairs and people are usually considered to exist wholly at a single time and are said to persist by enduring through time. Advocates of four-dimensionalism endorse perduring objects rather than enduring objects as the metaphysically basic entities. All events, processes and other physical objects are four-dimensional sub-blocks of the block-universe. The perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages and temporal slices and time slices). For example, a middle-aged man can be considered to be a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his childhood, his middle age and his future old age. These are three of his infinitely many temporal parts.

One argument against four-dimensionalism is that it allows an object to have too many temporal parts. Four-dimensionalism implies that, during every second in which an object exists, there are at least as many temporal parts of the object as there are sub-intervals of the mathematical line in the interval from zero to one. According to (Thomson 1983), this is too many parts for any object to have. Thomson also says that as the present moves along, present temporal parts move into the past and go out of existence while some future temporal parts "pop" into existence, and she complains that this popping in and out of existence is implausible. The four-dimensionalist can respond to these complaints by remarking that the present temporal parts do not go out of existence when they are no longer in the present; instead, they simply do not presently exist. Similarly dinosaurs have not popped out of existence; they simply do not exist presently.

According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easy time of solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken. The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken for the following reason:  We do not step into two different rivers, do we? Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-d river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-d game. For more discussion of this topic in metaphysics, see (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7).

Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional. Most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism and four-dimensionalism and McTaggart's B-theory.

One of A. N. Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” Prior says the B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of "Thank goodness that is over," since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless or tenseless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.

One B-theorist response is discussed in a later section, but another response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice that is saying, "Thank goodness that is over." Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is invalid.

Four-dimensionalism has implications for the philosophical problem of personal identity. According to four-dimensionalism, you as a teenager and you as a child are not the same person but rather are two different parts of one 4-dimensional person.

d. Truth Values and Free Will

The philosophical dispute about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory or eternalism has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past. The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur.

Suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that tomorrow the admiral orders a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. Advocates of the block-universe argue that, if so, then the above quoted sentence was true at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a tenseless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is true or false. If so, the sentence cannot have any other value such as “indeterminate” or "neither true or false now." Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart's B-camp, agree with Aristotle's suggestion that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth values is called the Aristotelian position because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.

The principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth values to predictions.

This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth values to predictions is undermined.

Second, according to the compatibilist, your choices affect the world, and if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions are different, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see Foreknowledge and Free Will.

A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:

There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.

So, we should wake up the admiral.

Without the premises in this argument having truth values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth values of the component sentences—that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so Aristotle’s position is implausible.

In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.

Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as "now" and "tomorrow" because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal sentences whose truth values are not relative to the situation because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as tenseless], and having fixed truth values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.

Philosophers are still divided on the issues of whether only the present is real, what sort of deductive logic to use for reasoning about time, and whether future contingent sentences have truth values.

9. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?

Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. For example, the Chinese, Burmese and Malay languages do not have any tenses. The English language expresses conceptions of time with tensed verbs but also in other ways, such as with the adverbial time phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” and with the adjective phrases "brand-new" and "ancient," and with the prepositions "until" and "since." Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in the past, in the present, or in the future.

There are two principal answers or theories. One is that tense distinctions represent objective features of reality that are not captured by eternalism and the block-universe approach.  This theory is said to "take tense seriously" and is called the tensed theory of time, or the A-theory. This theory claims that when we learn the truth values of certain tensed sentences we obtain knowledge that tenseless sentences do not provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time. Perhaps the tenseless theory rather than the tensed theory can be more useful for explaining human behavior than a tensed theory. Tenses are the same as positions in McTaggart's A-series, so the tensed theory is commonly associated with the A-camp that was discussed earlier in this article.

A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that tenses are merely subjective features of the perspective from which the speaking subject views the universe.  Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way, not of locating an event in the A-series, but rather of locating the event in time relative to the time that the verb is uttered or written. Actually this philosophical disagreement is not just about tenses in the grammatical sense. It is primarily about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark. The main metaphysical disagreement is about whether times and events have non-relational properties of pastness, presentness, and futurity. Does an event have or not have the property of, say, pastness independent of the event's relation to us and our temporal location?

On the tenseless theory of time, or the B-theory, whether the death of U. S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer occurred here depends on the speaker’s relation to the death event (Is the speaker standing at the battle site in Montana?); similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective (Is it now 1876 for the speaker?). The proponent of the tenseless view does not deny the importance or coherence of talk about the past, but will say it should be analyzed in terms of talk about the speaker's relation to events. My assertion that the event of Custer's death occurred in the past might be analyzed by the B-theorist as asserting that Custer's death event happens before the event of my writing this sentence. This latter assertion does not explicitly use the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense is an extraneous and eliminable feature of language, as is all use of the terminology of the A-series.

This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true. For the purposes of explaining this dispute, let us uncritically accept the Correspondence Theory of Truth and apply it to the following sentence:

Custer died in Montana.

If we apply the Correspondence Theory directly to this sentence, then the tensed theory or A-theory implies

The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tensed fact that Custer died in Montana.

The old tenseless theory or B-theory, created by Bertrand Russell (1915), would give a different analysis without tensed facts. It would say that the Correspondence Theory should be applied only to the result of first analyzing away tensed sentences into equivalent sentences that do not use tenses. Proponents of this classical tenseless theory prefer to analyze our sentence “Custer died in Montana” as having the same meaning as the following “eternal” sentence:

There is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of the writing of the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

In this analysis, the verb dies is logically tenseless (although grammatically it is in the present tense just like the "is" in "7 plus 5 is 12"). Applying the Correspondence Theory to this new sentence then yields:

The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tenseless fact that there is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of your reading the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

This Russell-like analysis is less straight-forward than the analysis offered by the tensed theory, but it does not use tensed facts.

This B-theory analysis is challenged by proponents of the tensed A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but a sentence can be true even if never read or inscribed. There are other challenges. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to analyze it as, say, “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical still needs analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress.

(Prior 1959) supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,

one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).

D.  H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart agree that tensed talk is important for understanding how we think and speak—the temporal indexicals are essential, as are other indexicals—but they claim it is not important for describing temporal, extra-linguistic reality. They advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be translated into tenseless ones. [The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true.  The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the conditional sentence "If it's snowing, then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically.]

According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, "It is now midnight," then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of "It is now midnight" are that my utterance occurs at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it's true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in the explanation of those truth conditions. Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory could say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over.” I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I'd be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Notice that appeal to tensed terminology was removed in that explanation.

In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences: that one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. Understanding a declarative sentence's truth conditions and its truth implications and how it behaves in a network of inferences is what we understand whenever we know the meaning of the sentence. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist. To summarize, tensed facts were presumed to be needed to account for the truth of tensed talk; but the new B-theory analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The theory concludes that we should not take seriously metaphysical tenses with their tensed facts because they are not needed for describing the objective features of the extra-linguistic world. Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.

10. What Gives Time Its Direction or Arrow?

Time's arrow is revealed in the way macroscopic or multi-particle processes tend to go over time, and that way is the direction toward disarray, the direction toward equilibrium, the direction toward higher entropy. For example, egg processes always go from unbroken eggs to omelets, never in the direction from omelets to unbroken eggs. The process of mixing coffee always goes from black coffee and cream toward brown coffee. You can’t unmix brown coffee. We can ring a bell but never un-ring it.

The arrow of a physical process is the way it normally goes, the way it normally unfolds through time. If a process goes only one-way, we call it an irreversible process; otherwise it is reversible. (Strictly speaking, a reversible process is one that is reversed by an infinitesimal change of its surrounding conditions, but we can overlook this fine point because of the general level of the present discussion.) The amalgamation of the universe’s irreversible processes produces the cosmic arrow of time, the master arrow. This arrow of time is the same for all of us. Usually this arrow is what is meant when one speaks of time’s arrow. So, time's arrow indicates directed processes in time, and the arrow may or may not have anything to do with the flow of time.

Because so many of the physical processes that we commonly observe do have an arrow, you might think that an inspection of the basic micro-physical laws would readily reveal time’s arrow. It will not. With some exceptions, such as the collapse of the quantum mechanical wave function and the decay of a B meson, all the basic laws of fundamental processes are time symmetric. A process that is time symmetric can go forward or backward in time; the laws allow both. Maxwell’s equations of electromagnetism, for example, can be used to predict that television signals can exist, but these equations do not tell us whether those signals arrive before or arrive after they are transmitted. In other words, the basic laws of science, its fundamental laws, do not by themselves imply an arrow of time. Something else must tell us why television signals are emitted from, but not absorbed into, TV antennas and why omelets don't turn into whole, unbroken eggs. The existence of the arrow of time is not derivable from the basic laws of science but is due to entropy, to the fact that entropy goes from low to high and not the other way.  But, as we will see in a moment, it is not clear why entropy behaves this way. So, how to explain the arrow is still an open question in science and philosophy.

a. Time without an Arrow

Time could exist in a universe that had no arrow, provided there was change in the universe. However, that change needs to be random change in which processes happen one way sometimes and the reverse way at other times. The second law of thermodynamics would fail in such a universe.

b. What Needs to be Explained

There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us (1) why time has an arrow; (2) why the basic laws of science do not reveal the arrow, (3) how the arrow is connected with entropy, (4) why the arrow is apparent in macro processes but not micro processes; (5) why the entropy of a closed system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (6) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (7) what are the characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (8) what the relationships are among the various more specific arrows of time—the various kinds of temporally asymmetric processes such as a B meson decay [the B-meson arrow], the collapse of the wave function [the quantum mechanical arrow], entropy increases [the thermodynamic arrow], causes preceding their effects [the causal arrow], light radiating away from hot objects rather than converging into them [the electromagnetic arrow], and our knowing the past more easily than the future [the knowledge arrow].

c. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow

There are three principal explanations of the arrow: (i) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of the universe, (ii) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to some as yet unknown asymmetrical laws of nature, (iii) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical.

Leibniz first proposed (iii), the so-called causal theory of time's order. Hans Reichenbach developed the idea in detail in 1928. He suggested that event A happens before event B if A could have caused B but B could not have caused A. The usefulness of this causal theory depends on a clarification of the notorious notions of causality and possibility without producing a circular explanation that presupposes an understanding of time order.

21st century physicists generally favor explanation (i). They say the most likely explanation of the emergence of an arrow of time in a world with time-blind basic laws is that the arrow is a product of the direction of entropy change. A leading suggestion is that this directedness of entropy change is due to increasing quantum entanglement plus the low-entropy state of the universe at the time of our Big Bang. Unfortunately there is no known explanation of why the entropy was so low at the time of our Big Bang. Some say the initially low entropy is just a brute fact with no more fundamental explanation. Others say it is due to as yet undiscovered basic laws that are time-asymmetric. And still others say it must be the product of the way the universe was before our Big Bang.

Before saying more about quantum entanglement let's describe entropy. There are many useful definitions of entropy. On one definition, it is a measure inversely related to the energy available for work in a physical system. According to another definition, the entropy of a physical system that is isolated from external influences is a measure [specifically, the logarithm] of how many microstates are macroscopically indistinguishable.  Less formally, entropy is a measure of how disordered or "messy" or "run down" a closed system is. More entropy implies more disorganization. Changes toward disorganization are so much more frequent than changes toward more organization because there are so many more ways for a closed system to be disorganized than for it to be organized. For example, there are so many more ways for the air molecules in an otherwise empty room to be scattered about evenly throughout the room giving it a uniform air density than there are ways for there to be a concentration of air within a sphere near the floor while the rest of the room is a vacuum. According to the 2nd Law of Thermodynamics, which is not one of our basic or fundamental laws of science, entropy in an isolated system or region never decreases in the future and almost always increases toward a state of equilibrium. Although Sadi Carnot discovered a version of the second law in 1824, Rudolf Clausius invented the concept of entropy and expressed the law in terms of heat. However, Ludwig Boltzmann generalized this work, expressed the law in terms of a more sophisticated concept of entropy involving atoms and their arrangements, and also tried to explain the law statistically as being due to the fact that there are so many more ways for a system of atoms to have arrangements with high entropy than arrangements with low entropy. This is why entropy flows from low to high naturally.

For example, if you float ice cubes in hot coffee, why do you end up with lukewarm coffee if you don’t interfere with this coffee-ice-cube system? And why doesn’t lukewarm coffee ever spontaneously turn into hot coffee with ice cubes? The answer from Boltzmann is that the number of macroscopically indistinguishable arrangements of the atoms in the system that appear to us as lukewarm coffee is so very much greater than the number of macroscopically indistinguishable arrangements of the atoms in the system that appear to us as ice cubes floating in the hot coffee. It is all about probabilities of arrangements of the atoms.

“What’s really going on [with the arrow of time pointing in the direction of equilibrium] is things are becoming more correlated with each other,” M.I.T. professor Seth Lloyd said. He was the first person to suggest that the arrow of time in any process is an arrow of increasing correlations as the particles in that process become more entangled with neighboring particles.

Said more simply and without mentioning entanglement, the change in entropy of a system that is not yet in equilibrium is a one-way street toward greater disorganization and less useful forms of energy. For example, when a car burns gasoline, the entropy increase is evident in the fact that the new heat energy distributed throughout the byproducts of  the gasoline combustion is much less useful than was the potential chemical energy in the pre-combustion gasoline. The entropy of our universe, conceived of as the largest isolated system, has been increasing for the last 13.8 billion years and will continue to do so for a very long time. At the time of the Big Bang, our universe was in a highly organized, low-entropy, non-equilibrium state, and it has been running down and getting more disorganized ever since. This running down is the cosmic arrow of time.

According to the 2nd Law of Thermodynamics, if an isolated system is not in equilibrium and has a great many particles, then it is overwhelmingly likely that the system's entropy will increase in the future. This 2nd law is universal but not fundamental because it apparently can be explained in terms of the behavior of the atoms making up the system. Ludwig Boltzmann was the first person to claim to have deduced the macroscopic 2nd law from reversible microscopic laws of Newtonian physics. Yet it seems too odd, said Joseph Loschmidt, that a one-way macroscopic process can be deduced from two-way microscopic processes. In 1876, Loschmidt argued that if you look at our present state (the black dot in the diagram below), then you ought to deduce from the basic laws (assuming you have no knowledge that the universe actually had lower entropy in the past) that it evolved not from a state of low entropy in the past, but from a state of higher entropy in the past, which of course is not at all what we know our past to be like. The difficulty is displayed in the diagram below.

graph of entropy vs. time

Yet we know our universe is an isolated system by definition, and we have good observational evidence that it surely did not have high entropy in the past—at least not in the past that is between now and the Big Bang—so the actual low value of entropy in the past is puzzling. Sean Carroll (2010) offers a simple illustration of the puzzle. If you found a half-melted ice cube in an isolated glass of water (analogous to the black dot in the diagram), and all you otherwise knew about the universe is that it obeys our current, basic time-reversible laws and you knew nothing about its low entropy past, then you'd infer, not surprisingly, that the ice cube would melt into a liquid in the future (solid green line). But, more surprisingly, you also would infer that your glass evolved from a state of  liquid water (dashed red line). You would not infer that the present half-melted state evolved from a state where the glass had a solid ice cube in it (dashed green line). To infer the solid cube you would need to appeal to your empirical experience of how processes are working around you, but you'd not infer the solid cube if all you had to work with were the basic time-reversible laws. To solve this so-called Loschmidt Paradox for the cosmos as a whole, and to predict the dashed green line rather than the dashed red line, physicists have suggested it is necessary to adopt the Past Hypothesis—that the universe at the time of the Big Bang was in a state of very low entropy. Using this Past Hypothesis, the most probable history of the universe over the last 13.8 billion years is one in which entropy increases.

Can the Past Hypothesis be justified from other principles? Some physicists (for example, Richard Feynman) and philosophers (for example, Craig Callender) say the initial low entropy may simply be a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for the initial low entropy. Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose say we need to keep looking for basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initial low entropy and thus for time’s arrow. A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis is that perhaps a future theory of quantum gravity will provide a justification of the Hypothesis. A fourth perspective appeals to God's having designed the Big Bang to start with low entropy. A fifth perspective appeals to the anthropic principle and the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics in order to argue that since there exist so many universes with different initial entropies, there had to be one universe like our particular universe with its initial low entropy—and that is the only reason why our universe had low entropy initially.

d. Multiple Arrows

The past and future are different in many ways that reflect the arrow of time. Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:

  1. We remember last week, not next week.
  2. There is evidence of the past but not of the future.
  3. Our present actions affect the future and not the past.
  4. It is easier to know the past than to know the future.
  5. Radio waves spread out from the antenna, but never converge into it.
  6. The universe expands in volume rather than shrinks.
  7. Causes precede their effects.
  8. We see black holes but never white holes.
  9. B meson decay, neutral kaon decay, and Higgs boson decay are each different in a time reversed world.
  10. Quantum mechanical measurement collapses the wave function.
  11. Possibilities decrease as time goes on.

Most physicists suspect all these arrows are linked so that we cannot have some arrows reversing while others do not. For example, the collapse of the wave function is generally considered to be due to an increase in the entropy of the universe. It is well accepted that entropy increase can account for the fact that we remember the past but not the future, that effects follow causes rather than precede them, and that animals grow old and never young. However, whether all the arrows are linked is still an open question.

e. Reversing the Arrow

Could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists suspect that the answer is yes, and they say it could have gone the other way if the initial conditions of the universe at our Big Bang had been different. Crudely put, if all the particles’ trajectories and charges are reversed, then the arrow of time would reverse. Here is a scenario of how it might happen. As our universe evolves closer to a point of equilibrium and very high entropy, time would lose its unidirectionality. Eventually, though, the universe could evolve away from equilibrium and perhaps it would evolve so that the directional processes we are presently familiar with would go in reverse. For example, we would get eggs from omelets very easily, but it would be too difficult to get omelets from eggs. Fires would absorb light instead of emit light. This new era would be an era of reversed time, and there would be a vaguely defined period of non-directional time separating the two eras.

If the cosmic arrow of time were to reverse this way, perhaps our past would be re-created and lived in reverse order. This re-occurrence of the past is different than the re-living of past events via time travel. With time travel the past is re-visited in the original order, not in reverse order.

Philosophers have asked interesting questions about the reversal of time’s arrow. What does it really mean to say time reverses? Does it require entropy to decrease on average in closed systems? If time were to reverse only in some far off corner of the universe, but not in our region of the universe, would dead people there become undead, and would the people there walk backwards up steps while remembering the future? First off, would it even be possible for them to be conscious? Assuming consciousness is caused by brain processes, could there be consciousness if their nerve pulses reversed, or would this reversal destroy consciousness? Supposing the answer is that they would be conscious, would people in that far off corner appear to us to be pre-cognitive if we could communicate with them? Would the feeling of being conscious be different for time-reversed people? [Here is one suggestion. There is one direction of time they would remember and call “the past,” and it would be when the entropy is lower. That is just as it is for us who do not experience time-reversal.] Consider communication between us and the inhabitants of that far off time-reversed region of the universe. If we sent a signal to the time-reversed region, could our message cross the border, or would it dissolve there, or would it bounce back? If residents of the time-reversed region successfully sent a recorded film across the border to us, should we play it in the ordinary way or in reverse?

11. What is Temporal Logic?

Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements (or propositions or sentences) about time imply which others. For example, in McTaggart's B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time.

Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:

Adam's arrival at the train station happened before Bryan's. Therefore, Bryan's arrival at the station did not happen before Adam's.

Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, namely point events, where the individual constant 'a' denotes Adam's arrival at the train station, and 'b' denotes Bryan's arrival at the train station. Let the two-argument relation B(x,y) be interpreted as "x happens before y." The direct translation produces:


Unfortunately, this formal reasoning is invalid. To make the formal argument become valid, we could make explicit the implicit premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we need to add the implicit premise:

∀x∀y[B(x,y)   ~B(y,x)]

So, we might want to add this principle as an axiom into our temporal logic.

In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. Suppose Adam arrived at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrived before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrived before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:


To make this argument be valid we need the implicit premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:

∀x∀y∀z [(B(x,y) & B(y,z))  B(x,z)]

What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Logicians have offered many suggestions: that B is irreflexive, that in any reference frame any two events are related somehow by the B relation (there are no disconnected pairs of events), that B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any two point events that are not simultaneous, and so forth.

The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic. The pioneer in the late 1950s was A. N. Prior. He created a new symbolic logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “twenty-three minutes afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.

Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false, and that have no indexicals whose reference can shift from one context to another.

Prior's main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, the modal operator that is interpreted to mean “it is possible that” is re-interpreted to mean “at some past time it was the case that” or, equivalently, “it once was the case that,” or "it once was that." Let the capital letter 'P' represent this operator. P will operate on present-tensed propositions, such as p. If p represents the proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp says Custer died in Montana. If Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then he may have found a way to eliminate any ontological commitment to non-present entities such as dinosaurs while preserving the possibility of true past tense propositions such as "There were dinosaurs."

Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq). The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.

If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)


Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.

The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the equivalence, for all propositions p and q,

Pp & Pq ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].

This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.

Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be

Pp ↔ ~H~p.

This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not the case that it is necessary that not-p.

A tense logic may need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic, but logicians still disagree about which axioms to accept.

It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn't come to an end; the reason is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.

Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth of a tensed proposition should be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, a modal proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true at a time t if and only if p is true at a time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.

The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.

The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. A predicate such as “is less than seven” does not involve time, but the predicate “is resting” does, even though both use the word "is". If the “x is resting” is represented classically as P(x), where P is a one-argument predicate, then it could be represented in temporal logic instead as the two-argument predicate P(x,t), and this would be interpreted as saying x has property P at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable 't' is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms. Suggested new axioms allow time to be a dense linear ordering of instantaneous instants or to be continuous or to have some other structure.

Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say 'n', to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let Q(t) be interpreted as “Socrates is sitting down at t.” The sentence or proposition that Socrates has always been sitting down may be translated into first-order temporal logic as

(∀t)[(t < n) → Q(t)].

Some temporal logics allow sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having the truth-values True, or False, or else Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, "There will be a sea battle tomorrow," are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.

Different temporal logics have been created depending on whether one wants to model circular time, discrete time, time obeying general relativity, the time of ordinary discourse, and so forth. For an introduction to tense logic and other temporal logics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

12. Supplements

a. Frequently Asked Questions

The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:

  1. What are Instants and Durations?
  2. What is an Event?
  3. What is a Reference Frame?
  4. What is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What is Spacetime?
  6. What is a Minkowski Diagram?
  7. What are the Metric and the Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Part of Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What is Time Dilation?
  16. How does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox (Clock Paradox)?
  19. What is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What does It Mean for a Clock To Be Accurate?
  24. What is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better Than Others?

b. What Science Requires of Time

c. Special Relativity: Proper times, Coordinate systems, and Lorentz Transformations

13. References and Further Reading

  • Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
    • Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present and its not being a global present.
  • Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
    • A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
  • Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
    • Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
  • Callender, Craig. "The Subjectivity of the Present," Chronos, V, 2003-4, pp. 108-126.
    • Surveys the psychological and neuroscience literature and suggests that the evidence tends to support the claim that our experience of the "now" is the experience of a subjective property rather than merely of an objective property, and it offers an interesting explanation of why so many people believe in the objectivity of the present.
  • Callender, Craig. "The Common Now," Philosophical Issues 18, pp. 339-361 (2008).
    • Develops the ideas presented in (Callender 2003-4).
  • Callender, Craig. "Is Time an Illusion?", Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
    • Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion because time emerges from a universe that is basically static.
  • Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
  • Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
    • Part Three "Entropy and Time's Arrow" provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time's arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of whether any interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of times goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
  • Carroll, Sean. "Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time," Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
    • Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening "now."
  • Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
    • A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s discovery in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating a free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice.
  • Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
    • A survey of all the topics in this article, but at a deeper level.
  • Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
    • An easy to read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity on our understanding of time.
  • Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
    • A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
  • Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
    • An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
  • Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
    • An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers most of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
  • Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
    • A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
  • Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
    • Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
    • An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
  • Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
    • Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 9c of the present article) for truth value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
  • Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
    • Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
  • Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this space dimension “imaginary time.”
  • Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
    • A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action.
  • Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
    • A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
    • Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
    • If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
  • Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
    • A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
  • Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
  • Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
  • McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
    • Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument that a single event is in the past, is present, and will be future yet it is inconsistent for an event to have more than one of these properties is called "McTaggart's Paradox." The chapter is renamed "The Unreality of Time," and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993).
  • Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
    • This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
  • Mozersky, M. Joshua. "The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century," in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
    • A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
  • Nadis, Steve. "Starting Point," Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
    • Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite but its future must be infinite.
  • Newton-Smith, W. H. The Structure of Time, Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
    • A survey of the philosophical issues involving time. It emphasizes the logical and mathematical structure of time.
  • Norton, John. "Time Really Passes," Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
    • Argues that "We don't find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion."
  • Øhrstrøm, P. and P.  F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
    • An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
  • Perry, John. "The Problem of the Essential Indexical," Noûs, 13(1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
    • Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
  • Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
    • Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that t in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses.
  • Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
    • A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
  • Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
    • Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
  • Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
    • A pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, which permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
  • Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
    • Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
  • Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
    • A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
  • Putnam, Hilary. "Time and Physical Geometry," The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
    • Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist and why Aristotle was wrong if Relativity is right.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "On the Experience of Time," Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
    • The classical tenseless theory.
  • Saunders, Simon. "How Relativity Contradicts Presentism," in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
    • Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
  • Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
  • Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
    • A good account of the twin paradox.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
    • A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the esxistence of changeless intervals in the universe could be detected.
  • Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
    • Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
    • Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivialism fails.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
    • Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
  • Steinhardt, Paul J. "The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?" Scientific American, April, 2011, pp. 36-43.
    • Argues that the Big Bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of Big Bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis. "Parthood and Identity across Time," Journal of Philosophy 80, 1983, 201-20.
    • Argues against four-dimensionalism and its idea of objects having infinitely many temporal parts.
  • Thorne, Kip S. Black Holes and Time Warps: Einstein’s Outrageous Legacy, W. W. Norton & Co., 1994.
    • Chapter 14 is a popular account of how to use a wormhole to create a time machine.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
  • Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
    • An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our Big Bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
  • Whitrow. G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
    • A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.

The Infinite

Working with the infinite is tricky business. Zeno’s paradoxes first alerted philosophers to this in 450 B.C.E. when he argued that a fast runner such as Achilles has an infinite number of places to reach during the pursuit of a slower runner. Since then, there has been a struggle to understand how to use the notion of infinity in a coherent manner. This article concerns the significant and controversial role that the concepts of infinity and the infinite play in the disciplines of philosophy, physical science, and mathematics.

Philosophers want to know whether there is more than one coherent concept of infinity; which entities and properties are infinitely large, infinitely small, infinitely divisible, and infinitely numerous; and what arguments can justify answers one way or the other.

Here are four suggested examples of these different ways to be infinite. The density of matter at the center of a black hole is infinitely large. An electron is infinitely small. An hour is infinitely divisible. The integers are infinitely numerous. These four claims are ordered from most to least controversial, although all four have been challenged in the philosophical literature.

This article also explores a variety of other questions about the infinite. Is the infinite something indefinite and incomplete, or is it complete and definite? What does Thomas Aquinas mean when he says God is infinitely powerful? Was Gauss, who was one of the greatest mathematicians of all time, correct when he made the controversial remark that scientific theories involve infinities merely as idealizations and merely in order to make for easy applications of those theories, when in fact all physically real entities are finite? How did the invention of set theory change the meaning of the term “infinite”? What did Cantor mean when he said some infinities are smaller than others? Quine said the first three sizes of Cantor’s infinities are the only ones we have reason to believe in. Mathematical Platonists disagree with Quine. Who is correct? We shall see that there are deep connections among all these questions.

Table of Contents

  1. What “Infinity” Means
    1. Actual, Potential, and Transcendental Infinity
    2. The Rise of the Technical Terms
  2. Infinity and the Mind
  3. Infinity in Metaphysics
  4. Infinity in Physical Science
    1. Infinitely Small and Infinitely Divisible
    2. Singularities
    3. Idealization and Approximation
    4. Infinity in Cosmology
  5. Infinity in Mathematics
    1. Infinite Sums
    2. Infinitesimals and Hyperreals
    3. Mathematical Existence
    4. Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory
    5. The Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis
  6. Infinity in Deductive Logic
    1. Finite and Infinite Axiomatizability
    2. Infinitely Long Formulas
    3. Infinitely Long Proofs
    4. Infinitely Many Truth Values
    5. Infinite Models
    6. Infinity and Truth
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. What “Infinity” Means

The term “the infinite” refers to whatever it is that the word “infinity” correctly applies to. For example, the infinite integers exist just in case there is an infinity of integers. We also speak of infinite quantities, but what does it mean to say a quantity is infinite? In 1851, Bernard Bolzano argued in The Paradoxes of the Infinite that, if a quantity is to be infinite, then the measure of that quantity also must be infinite. Bolzano’s point is that we need a clear concept of infinite number in order to have a clear concept of infinite quantity. This idea of Bolzano’s has led to a new way of speaking about infinity, as we shall see.

The term “infinite” can be used for many purposes. The logician Alfred Tarski used it for dramatic purposes when he spoke about trying to contact his wife in Nazi-occupied Poland in the early 1940s. He complained, “We have been sending each other an infinite number of letters. They all disappear somewhere on the way. As far as I know, my wife has received only one letter.” (Feferman 2004, p. 137) Although the meaning of a term is intimately tied to its use, we can tell only a very little about the meaning of the term from Tarski’s use of it to exaggerate for dramatic effect.

Looking back over the last 2,500 years of use of the term “infinite,” three distinct senses stand out: actually infinite, potentially infinite, and transcendentally infinite. These will be discussed in more detail below, but briefly the concept of potential infinity treats infinity as an unbounded or non-terminating process developing over time. By contrast, the concept of actual infinity treats the infinite as timeless and complete. Transcendental infinity is the least precise of the three concepts and is more commonly used in discussions of metaphysics and theology to suggest transcendence of human understanding or human capability. To give some examples, the set of integers is actually infinite, and so is the number of locations (points of space) between London and Moscow. The maximum length of grammatical sentences in English is potentially infinite, and so is the total amount of memory in a Turing machine, an ideal computer. An omnipotent being’s power is transcendentally infinite.

For purposes of doing mathematics and science, the actual infinite has turned out to be the most useful of the three concepts. Using the idea proposed by Bolzano that was mentioned above, the concept of the actual infinite was precisely defined in 1888 when Richard Dedekind redefined the term “infinity” for use in set theory and Georg Cantor made the infinite, in this sense, an object of mathematical study. Before this turning point, the philosophical community would have said that Aristotle’s concept of potential infinity should be the concept used in mathematics and science.

a. Actual, Potential, and Transcendental Infinity

The Ancient Greeks generally conceived of the infinite as formless, characterless, indefinite, indeterminate, chaotic, and unintelligible. The term had negative connotations and was especially vague, having no clear criteria for distinguishing the finite from the infinite. In his treatment of Zeno’s paradoxes about infinite divisibility, Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) made a positive step toward clarification by distinguishing two different concepts of infinity, potential infinity and actual infinity. The latter is also called complete infinity and completed infinity. The actual infinite is not a process in time; it is an infinity that exists wholly at one time. By contrast, Aristotle spoke of the potentially infinite as a never-ending process over time. The word “potential” is being used in a technical sense. A potential swimmer can learn to become an actual swimmer, but a potential infinity cannot become an actual infinity. Aristotle argued that all the problems involving reasoning with infinity are really problems of improperly applying the incoherent concept of actual infinity instead of the coherent concept of potential infinity. (See Aristotle’s Physics, Book III, for his account of infinity.)

For its day, this was a successful way of treating Zeno’s Achilles paradox since, if Zeno had confined himself to using only potential infinity, he would not have been able to develop his paradoxical argument. Here is why. Zeno said that to go from the start to the finish line, the runner must reach the place that is halfway-there, then after arriving at this place he still must reach the place that is half of that remaining distance, and after arriving there he again must reach the new place that is now halfway to the goal, and so on. These are too many places to reach because there is no end to these place since for any one there is another. Zeno made the mistake, according to Aristotle, of supposing that this infinite process needs completing when it really doesn’t; the finitely long path from start to finish exists undivided for the runner, and it is the mathematician who is demanding the completion of such a process. Without that concept of a completed infinite process there is no paradox.

Although today’s standard treatment of the Achilles paradox disagrees with Aristotle and says Zeno was correct to use the concept of a completed infinity and to imply the runner must go to an actual infinity of places in a finite time, Aristotle had so many other intellectual successes that his ideas about infinity dominated the Western world for the next two thousand years.

Even though Aristotle promoted the belief that “the idea of the actual infinite−of that whose infinitude presents itself all at once−was close to a contradiction in terms…,” (Moore 2001, 40) during those two thousand years others did not treat it as a contradiction in terms. Archimedes, Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, Gregory of Rimini, and Leibniz made use of it. Archimedes used it, but had doubts about its legitimacy. Leibniz used it but had doubts about whether it was needed.

Here is an example of how Gregory of Rimini argued in the fourteenth century for the coherence of the concept of actual infinity:

If God can endlessly add a cubic foot to a stone–which He can–then He can create an infinitely big stone. For He need only add one cubic foot at some time, another half an hour later, another a quarter of an hour later than that, and so on ad infinitum. He would then have before Him an infinite stone at the end of the hour. (Moore 2001, 53)

Leibniz envisioned the world as being an actual infinity of mind-like monads, and in (Leibniz 1702) he freely used the concept of being infinitesimally small in his development of the calculus in mathematics.

The term “infinity” that is used in contemporary mathematics and science is based on a technical development of this earlier, informal concept of actual infinity. This technical concept was not created until late in the 19th century.

b. The Rise of the Technical Terms

In the centuries after the decline of ancient Greece, the word “infinite” slowly changed its meaning in Medieval Europe. Theologians promoted the idea that God is infinite because He is limitless, and this at least caused the word “infinity” to lose its negative connotations. Eventually during the Medieval Period, the word had come to mean endless, unlimited, and immeasurable–but not necessarily chaotic. The question of its intelligibility and conceivability by humans was disputed.

Actual infinity is very different. There are actual infinities in the technical, post-1880s sense, which are neither endless, unlimited, nor immeasurable. A line segment one meter long is a good example. It is not endless because it is finitely long, and it is not a process because it is timeless. It is not unlimited because it is limited by both zero and one. It is not immeasurable because its length measure is one meter. Nevertheless, the one meter line is infinite in the technical sense because it has an actual infinity of sub-segments, and it has an actual infinity of distinct points. So, there definitely has been a conceptual revolution.

This can be very shocking to those people who are first introduced to the technical term “actual infinity.” It seems not to be the kind of infinity they are thinking about. The crux of the problem is that these people really are using a different concept of infinity. The sense of infinity in ordinary discourse these days is either the Aristotelian one of potential infinity or the medieval one that requires infinity to be endless, immeasurable, and perhaps to have connotations of perfection, inconceivability, and paradox. This article uses the name transcendental infinity for the medieval concept although there is no generally accepted name for the concept. A transcendental infinity transcends human limits and detailed knowledge; it might be incapable of being described by a precise theory. It might also be a cluster of concepts rather than a single one.

Those people who are surprised when first introduced to the technical term “actual infinity” are probably thinking of either potential infinity or transcendental infinity, and that is why, in any discussion of infinity, some philosophers will say that an appeal to the technical term “actual infinity” is changing the subject. Another reason why there is opposition to actual infinities is that they have so many counter-intuitive properties. For example, consider a continuous line that has an actual infinity of points. A single point on this line has no next point! Also, a one-dimensional continuous curve can fill a two-dimensional area. Equally counterintuitive is the fact that some actually infinite numbers are smaller than other actually infinite numbers. Looked at more optimistically, though, most other philosophers will say the rise of this technical term is yet another example of how the discovery of a new concept has propelled civilization forward.

Resistance to the claim that there are actual infinities has had two other sources. One is the belief that actual infinities cannot be experienced. The second is the belief that use of the concept of actual infinity leads to paradoxes, such as Zeno’s. Because the standard solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes makes use of calculus, the birth of the new technical definition of actual infinity is intimately tied to the development of calculus and thus to properly defining the mathematician’s real line, the linear continuum. Briefly, the reason is that science needs calculus; calculus needs the continuum; the continuum needs a very careful definition; and the best definition requires there to be actual infinities (not merely potential infinities) in the micro-structure and the overall macro-structure of the continuum.

Defining the continuum involves defining real numbers because the linear continuum is the intended model of the theory of real numbers just as the plane is the intended model for the theory of ordinary two-dimensional geometry. It was eventually realized by mathematicians that giving a careful definition to the continuum and to real numbers requires formulating their definitions within set theory. As part of that formulation, mathematicians found a good way to define a rational number in the language of set theory; then they defined a real number to be a certain pair of actually infinite sets of rational numbers. The continuum’s eventual definition required it to be an actually infinite collection whose elements are themselves infinite sets. The details are too complex to be presented here, but the curious reader can check any textbook in classical real analysis. The intuitive picture is that any interval or segment of the continuum is a continuum, and any continuum is a very special infinite set of points that are packed so closely together that there are no gaps. A continuum is perfectly smooth. This smoothness is reflected in there being a great many real numbers between any two real numbers.

Calculus is the area of mathematics that is more applicable to science than any other area. It can be thought of as a technique for treating a continuous change as being composed of an infinite number of infinitesimal changes. When calculus is applied to physical properties capable of change such as spatial location, ocean salinity or an electrical circuit’s voltage, these properties are represented with continuous variables that have real numbers for their values. These values are specific real numbers, not ranges of real numbers and not just rational numbers. Achilles’ location along the path to his goal is such a property.

It took many centuries to rigorously develop the calculus. A very significant step in this direction occurred in 1888 when Richard Dedekind re-defined the term “infinity” and when Georg Cantor used that definition to create the first set theory, a theory that eventually was developed to the point where it could be used for embedding all classical mathematical theories. See the example in the Zeno's Paradoxes article of how Dedekind used set theory and his new idea of "cuts" to define the real numbers in terms of infinite sets of rational numbers. In this way additional rigor was given to the concepts of mathematics, and it encouraged more mathematicians to accept the notion of actually infinite sets. What this embedding requires is first defining the terms of any mathematical theory in the language of set theory, then translating the axioms and theorems of the mathematical theory into sentences of set theory, and then showing that these theorems follow logically from the axioms. (The axioms of any theory, such as set theory, are the special sentences of the theory that can always be assumed during the process of deducing the other theorems of the theory.)

The new technical treatment of infinity that originated with Dedekind in 1888 and adopted by Cantor in his new set theory provided a definition of "infinite set" rather than simply “infinite.” Dedekind says an infinite set is a set that is not finite. The notion of a finite set can be defined in various ways. We might define it numerically as a set having n members, where n is some non-negative integer. Dedekind found an essentially equivalent definition of finite set (assuming the axiom of choice, which will be discussed later), but Dedekind’s definition does not require mentioning numbers:

A (Dedekind) finite set is a set for which there exists no one-to-one correspondence between it and one of its proper subsets.

By placing the finger-tips of your left hand on the corresponding finger-tips of your right hand, you establish a one-to-one correspondence between the set of fingers of each hand; in that way you establish that there are the same number of fingers on each of your hands, without your needing to count the fingers. More generally, there is a one-to-one correspondence between two sets when each member of one set can be paired off with a unique member of the other set, so that neither set has an unpaired member.

Here is a one-to-one correspondence between the natural numbers and the even, positive numbers:

1, 2, 3, 4, ...

↕   ↕   ↕  ↕

2, 4, 6, 8, ...

Informally expressed, any infinite set can be matched up to a part of itself; so the whole is equivalent to a part. This is a surprising definition because, before this definition was adopted, the idea that actually infinite wholes are equinumerous with some of their parts was taken as clear evidence that the concept of actual infinity is inherently paradoxical. For a systematic presentation of the many alternative ways to successfully define “infinite set” non-numerically, see (Tarski 1924).

Dedekind’s new definition of "infinite" is defining an actually infinite set, not a potentially infinite set because Dedekind appealed to no continuing operation over time. The concept of a potentially infinite set is then given a new technical definition by saying a potentially infinite set is a growing, finite subset of an actually infinite set. Cantor expressed the point this way:

In order for there to be a variable quantity in some mathematical study, the “domain” of its variability must strictly speaking be known beforehand through a definition. However, this domain cannot itself be something variable…. Thus this “domain” is a definite, actually infinite set of values. Thus each potential infinite…presupposes an actual infinite. (Cantor 1887)

The new idea is that the potentially infinite set presupposes an actually infinite one. If this is correct, then Aristotle’s two notions of the potential infinite and actual infinite have been redefined and clarified.

Two sets are the same if any member of one is a member of the other, and vice versa. Order of the members is irrelevant to the identity of the set, and to the size of the set. Two sets are the same size if there exists a one-to-one correspondence between them. This definition of same size was recommended by both Cantor and Frege. Cantor defined “finite” by saying a set is finite if it is in one-to-one correspondence with the set {1, 2, 3, …, n} for some positive integer n; and he said a set is infinite if it is not finite.

Cardinal numbers are measures of the sizes of sets. There are many definitions of what a cardinal number is, but what is essential for cardinal numbers is that two sets have the same cardinal just in case there is a one-to-one correspondence between them; and set A has a smaller cardinal number than a set B (and so set A has fewer members than B) provided there is a one-to-one correspondence between A and a subset of B, but B is not the same size as A. In this sense, the set of even integers does not have fewer members than the set of all integers, although intuitively you might think it does.

How big is infinity? This question does not make sense for either potential infinity or transcendental infinity, but it does for actual infinity. Finite cardinal numbers such as 0, 1, 2, and 3 are measures of the sizes of finite sets, and transfinite cardinal numbers are measures of the sizes of actually infinite sets. The transfinite cardinals are aleph-null, aleph-one, aleph-two, and so on, which we represent with the numerals ℵ0, ℵ1, ℵ2, .... The smallest infinite size is ℵ0 which is the size of the set of natural numbers, and it is called a countable infinity; the other alephs are measures of the uncountable infinities. However, these are somewhat misleading terms since no process of counting is involved. Nobody would have the time to count from 0 to any aleph.

The set of even integers, the set of natural numbers and the set of rational numbers all can be shown to have the same size, but surprisingly they all are smaller than the set of real numbers. Any set of size ℵ0 is said to be countably infinite (or denumerably infinite or enumerably infinite). The set of points in the continuum and in any interval of the continuum turns out to be larger than ℵ0, although how much larger is still an open problem, called the continuum problem. A popular but controversial suggestion is that a continuum is of size ℵ1, the next larger size.

When creating set theory, mathematicians did not begin with the belief that there would be so many points between any two points in the continuum nor with the belief that for any infinite cardinal there is a larger cardinal. These were surprising consequences discovered by Cantor. To many philosophers, this surprise is evidence that what is going on is not invention but rather is discovery about a mind-independent reality.

The intellectual community has always been wary of actually infinite sets. Before the discovery of how to embed calculus within set theory (a process that is also called giving calculus a basis in set theory), it could have been more easily argued that science does not need actual infinities. The burden of proof has now shifted, and the default position is that actual infinites are indispensable in mathematics and science, and anyone who wants to do without them must show that removing them does not do too much damage and has additional benefits. There are no known successful attempts to reconstruct the theories of mathematical physics without basing them on mathematical objects such as numbers and sets, but for one attempt to do so using second-order logic, see (Field 1980).

Here is why some mathematicians believe the set-theoretic basis is so important:

Just as chemistry was unified and simplified when it was realized that every chemical compound is made of atoms, mathematics was dramatically unified when it was realized that every object of mathematics can be taken to be the same kind of thing. There are now other ways than set theory to unify mathematics, but before set theory there was no such unifying concept. Indeed, in the Renaissance, mathematicians hesitated to add x2 to x3, since the one was an area and the other a volume. Since the advent of set theory, one can correctly say that all mathematicians are exploring the same mental universe. (Rucker 1982, p. 64)

But the significance of this basis can be exaggerated. The existence of the basis does not imply that mathematics is set theory.

However, paradoxes soon were revealed within set theory, by Cantor himself and then others, so the quest for a more rigorous definition of the mathematical continuum continued. Cantor’s own paradox surfaced in 1895 when he asked whether the set of all cardinal numbers has a cardinal number. Cantor showed that, if it does, then it doesn’t. Surely the set of all sets would have the greatest cardinal number, but Cantor showed that for any cardinal number there is a greater cardinal number.  [For more details about this and the other paradoxes, see (Suppes 1960).] The most famous paradox of set theory is Russell’s Paradox of 1901. He showed that the set of all sets that are not members of themselves is both a member of itself and not a member of itself. Russell wrote that the paradox “put an end to the logical honeymoon that I had been enjoying.”

These and other paradoxes were eventually resolved satisfactorily by finding revised axioms of set theory that permit the existence of enough well-behaved sets so that set theory is not crippled [that is, made incapable of providing a basis for mathematical theories] and yet the axioms do not permit the existence of too many sets, the ill-behaved sets such as Cantor’s set of all cardinals and Russell’s set of all sets that are not members of themselves. Finally, by the mid-20th century, it had become clear that, despite the existence of competing set theories, Zermelo-Fraenkel’s set theory (ZF) was the best way or the least radical way to revise set theory in order to avoid all the known paradoxes and problems while at the same time preserving enough of our intuitive ideas about sets that it deserved to be called a set theory, and at this time most mathematicians would have agreed that the continuum had been given a proper basis in ZF. See (Kleene 1967, pp. 189-191) for comments on this agreement about ZF’s success and for a list of the ZF axioms and for a detailed explanation of why each axiom deserves to be an axiom.

Because of this success, and because it was clear enough that the concept of infinity used in ZF does not lead to contradictions, and because it seemed so evident how to use the concept in other areas of mathematics and science where the term “infinity” was being used, the definition of the concept of "infinite set" within ZF was claimed by many philosophers to be the paradigm example of how to provide a precise and fruitful definition of a philosophically significant concept. Much less attention was then paid to critics who had complained that we can never use the word “infinity” coherently because infinity is ineffable or inherently paradoxical.

Nevertheless there was, and still is, serious philosophical opposition to actually infinite sets and to ZF's treatment of the continuum, and this has spawned the programs of constructivism, intuitionism, finitism and ultrafinitism, all of whose advocates have philosophical objections to actual infinities. Even though there is much to be said in favor of replacing a murky concept with a clearer, technical concept, there is always the worry that the replacement is a change of subject that hasn’t really solved the problems it was designed for. This discussion of the role of infinity in mathematics and science continues in later sections of this article.

2. Infinity and the Mind

Can humans grasp the concept of the infinite? This seems to be a profound question. Ever since Zeno, intellectuals have realized that careless reasoning about infinity can lead to paradox and perhaps “defeat” the human mind. Some critics of infinity argue that paradox is essential to, or inherent in, the use of the concept of infinity, so the infinite is beyond the grasp of the human mind. However, this criticism applies more properly to some forms of transcendental infinity rather than to either actual infinity or potential infinity.

A second reason to believe humans cannot grasp infinity is that the concept must contain an infinite number of parts or sub-ideas. A counter to this reason is to defend the psychological claim that if a person succeeds in thinking about infinity, it does not follow that the person needs to have an actually infinite number of ideas in mind at one time.

A third reason to believe the concept of infinity is beyond human understanding is that to have the concept one must have some accurate mental picture of infinity. Thomas Hobbes, who believed that all thinking is based on imagination, might remark that nobody could picture an infinite number of grains of sand at once. However, most contemporary philosophers of psychology believe mental pictures are not essential to having any concept. Regarding the concept of dog, you might have a picture of a brown dog in your mind and I might have a picture of a black dog in mine, but I can still understand you perfectly well when you say dogs frequently chase cats.

The main issue here is whether we can coherently think about infinity to the extent of being said to have the concept. Here is a simple argument that we can: If we understand negation and have the concept of finite, then the concept of infinite is merely the concept of not-finite. A second argument says the apparent consistency of set theory indicates that infinity in the technical sense of actual infinity is well within our grasp. And since potential infinity is definable in terms of actual infinity, it, too, is within our grasp.

Assuming that infinity is within our grasp, what is it that we are grasping? Philosophers disagree on the answer. In 1883, Cantor said

A set is a Many which allows itself to be thought of as a One.

Notice the dependence on thought. Cantor eventually clarified what he meant and was clear that he did not want set existence to depend on mental capability. What he really believed is that a set is a collection of well-defined and distinct objects that exists independently of being thought of, but that could be thought of by a powerful enough mind.

3. Infinity in Metaphysics

There is a concept which corrupts and upsets all others. I refer not to Evil, whose limited realm is that of ethics; I refer to the infinite. —Jorge Luis Borges.

Shakespeare declared, “The will is infinite.” Is he correct or just exaggerating? Critics of Shakespeare, interpreted literally, might argue that the will is basically a product of different brain states. Because a person’s brain contains approximately 1027 atoms, these have only a finite number of configurations or states, and so, regardless of whether we interpret Shakespeare’s remark as implying that the will is unbounded (is potentially infinite) or the will produces an infinite number of brain states (is actually infinite), the will is not infinite. But perhaps Shakespeare was speaking metaphorically and did not intend to be taken literally, or perhaps he meant to use some version of transcendental infinity that makes infinity be somehow beyond human comprehension.

Contemporary Continental philosophers often speak that way. Emmanuel Levinas says the infinite is another name for the Other, for the existence of other conscious beings besides ourselves whom we are ethically responsible for. We “face the infinite” in the sense of facing a practically incomprehensible and unlimited number of possibilities upon encountering another conscious being. (See Levinas 1961.) If we ask what sense of “infinite” is being used by Levinas, it may be yet another concept of infinity, or it may be some kind of transcendental infinity. Another interpretation is that he is exaggerating about the number of possibilities and should say instead that there are too many possibilities to be faced when we encounter another conscious being and that the possibilities are not readily predictable because other conscious beings make free choices, the causes of which often are not known even to the person making the choice.

Leibniz was one of the few persons in earlier centuries who believed in actually infinite sets, but he did not believe in infinite numbers. Cantor did. Referring to his own discovery of the transfinite cardinals ℵ0, ℵ1, ℵ2, .... and their properties, Cantor claimed his work was revealing God’s existence and that these mathematical objects were in the mind of God. He claimed God gave humans the concept of the infinite so that they could reflect on His perfection. Influential German neo-Thomists such as Constantin Gutberlet agreed with Cantor. Some Jesuit math instructors claim that by taking a calculus course and understanding infinity, students are getting closer to God. Their critics complain that these mystical ideas about infinity and God are too speculative.

When metaphysicians speak of infinity they use all three concepts: potential infinity, actual infinity, and transcendental infinity. But when they speak about God being infinite, they are usually interested in implying that God is beyond human understanding or that there is a lack of a limit on particular properties of God, such as God's goodness and knowledge and power.

The connection between infinity and God exists in nearly all of the world’s religions. It is prominent in Hindu, Muslim, Jewish, and Christian literature. For example, in chapter 11 of the Bhagavad Gita of Hindu scripture, Krishna says, “O Lord of the universe, I see You everywhere with infinite form....”

Plato did not envision God (the Demi-urge) as infinite because he viewed God as perfect, and he believed anything perfect must be limited and thus not infinite because the infinite was defined as an unlimited, unbounded, indefinite, unintelligible chaos.

But the meaning of the term “infinite” slowly began to change. Over six hundred years later, the Neo-Platonist philosopher Plotinus was one of the first important Greek philosophers to equate God with the infinite−although he did not do so explicitly. He said instead that any idea abstracted from our finite experience is not applicable to God. He probably believed that if God were finite in some aspect, then there could be something beyond God and therefore God wouldn’t be “the One.” Plotinus was influential in helping remove the negative connotations that had accompanied the concept of the infinite. One difficulty here, though, is that it is unclear whether metaphysicians have discovered that God is identical with the transcendentally infinite or whether they are simply defining “God” to be that way. A more severe criticism is that perhaps they are just defining “infinite” (in the transcendental sense) as whatever God is.

Augustine, who merged Platonic philosophy with the Christian religion, spoke of God “whose understanding is infinite” for “what are we mean wretches that dare presume to limit His knowledge?” Augustine wrote that the reason God can understand the infinite is that “...every infinity is, in a way we cannot express, made finite to God....” [City of God, Book XII, ch. 18] This is an interesting perspective. Medieval philosophers debated whether God could understand infinite concepts other than Himself, not because God had limited understanding, but because there was no such thing as infinity anywhere except in God.

The medieval philosopher Thomas Aquinas, too, said God has infinite knowledge. He definitely did not mean potentially infinite knowledge. The technical definition of actual infinity might be useful here. If God is infinitely knowledgeable, this can be understood perhaps as meaning that God knows the truth values of all declarative sentences and that the set of these sentences is actually infinite.

Aquinas argued in his Summa Theologia that, although God created everything, nothing created by God can be actually infinite. His main reason was that anything created can be counted, yet if an infinity were created, then the count would be infinite, but no infinite numbers exist to do the counting (as Aristotle had also said). In his day this was a better argument than today because Cantor created (or discovered) infinite numbers in the late 19th century.

René Descartes believed God was actually infinite, and he remarked that the concept of actual infinity is so awesome that no human could have created it or deduced it from other concepts, so any idea of infinity that humans have must have come from God directly. Thus God exists. Descartes is using the concept of infinity to produce a new ontological argument for God’s existence.

David Hume, and many other philosophers, raised the problem that if God has infinite power then there need not be evil in the world, and if God has infinite goodness, then there should not be any evil in the world. This problem is often referred to as "The Problem of Evil" and has been a long standing point of contention for theologians.

Spinoza and Hegel envisioned God, or the Absolute, pantheistically. If they are correct, then to call God infinite, is to call the world itself infinite. Hegel denigrated Aristotle’s advocacy of potential infinity and claimed the world is actually infinite. Traditional Christian, Muslim and Jewish metaphysicians do not accept the pantheistic notion that God is at one with the world. Instead they say God transcends the world. Since God is outside space and time, the space and time that he created may or may not be infinite, depending on God’s choice, but surely everything else he created is finite, they say.

The multiverse theories of cosmology in the early 21st century allow there to be an uncountable infinity of universes within a background space whose volume is actually infinite. The universe created by our Big Bang is just one of these many universes. Christian theologians balk at the notion of God choosing to create this multiverse because the theory implies that, although there are so many universes radically different from ours, there also are an actually infinite number of copies of ours, which implies there are an infinite number of Jesuses who have been crucified on the cross. The removal of the uniqueness of Jesus is apparently a removal of his dignity. Augustine had this worry when considering infinite universes, and he responded that "Christ died once for sinners...."

There are many other entities and properties that some metaphysician or other has claimed are infinite: places, possibilities, propositions, properties, particulars, partial orderings, pi’s decimal expansion, predicates, proofs, Plato’s forms, principles, power sets, probabilities, positions, and possible worlds. That is just for the letter p. Some of these are considered to be abstract objects, objects outside of space and time, and others are considered to be concrete objects, objects within, or part of, space and time.

For helpful surveys of the history of infinity in theology and metaphysics, see (Owen 1967) and (Moore 2001).

4. Infinity in Physical Science

From a metaphysical perspective, the theories of mathematical physics seem to be ontologically committed to objects and their properties. If any of those objects or properties are infinite, then physics is committed to there being infinity within the physical world.

Here are four suggested examples where infinity occurs within physical science. (1) Standard cosmology based on Einstein’s general theory of relativity implies the density of the mass at the center of a simple black hole is infinitely large (even though black hole’s total mass is finite). (2) The Standard Model of particle physics implies the size of an electron is infinitely small. (3) General relativity implies that every path in space is infinity divisible. (4) Classical quantum theory implies the values of kinetic energy of an accelerating, free electron are infinitely numerous. These four kinds of infinities—infinite large, infinitely small, infinitely divisible, and infinitely numerous—are implied by theory and argumentation, and are not something that could be measured directly.

Objecting to taking scientific theories at face value, the 18th century British empiricists George Berkeley and David Hume denied the physical reality of even potential infinities on the empiricist grounds that such infinities are not detectable by our sense organs. Most philosophers of the 21st century would say that Berkeley’s and Hume’s empirical standards are too rigid because they are based on the mistaken assumption that our knowledge of reality must be a complex built up from simple impressions gained from our sense organs.

But in the spirit of Berkeley and Hume’s empiricism, instrumentalists also challenge any claim that science tells us the truth about physical infinities. The instrumentalists say that all theories of science are merely effective “instruments” designed for explanatory and predictive success. A scientific theory’s claims are neither true nor false. By analogy, a shovel is an effective instrument for digging, but a shovel is neither true nor false. The instrumentalist would say our theories of mathematical physics imply only that reality looks “as if” there are physical infinities. Some realists on this issue respond that to declare it to be merely a useful mathematical fiction that there are physical infinities is just as misleading as to say it is a mere fiction that moving planets actually have inertia or petunias actually contain electrons. We have no other tool than theory-building for accessing the existing features of reality that are not directly perceptible. If our best theories—those that have been well tested and are empirically successful and make novel predictions—use theoretical terms that refer to infinities, then infinities must be accepted. See (Leplin 2000) for more details about anti-realist arguments, such as those of instrumentalism and constructive empiricism.

a. Infinitely Small and Infinitely Divisible

Consider the size of electrons and quarks, the two main components of atoms. All scientific experiments so far have been consistent with electrons and quarks having no internal structure (components), as our best scientific theories imply, so the "simple conclusion" is that electrons are infinitely small, or infinitesimal, and zero-dimensional. Is this “simple conclusion” too simple? Some physicists speculate that there are no physical particles this small and that, in each subsequent century, physicists will discover that all the particles of the previous century have a finite size due to some inner structure. However, most physicists withhold judgment on this point about the future of physics.

A second reason to question whether the “simple conclusion” is too simple is that electrons, quarks, and all other elementary particles behave in a quantum mechanical way. They have a wave nature as well as a particle nature, and they have these simultaneously. When probing an electron’s particle nature it is found to have no limit to how small it can be, but when probing the electron’s wave nature, the electron is found to be spread out through all of space, although it is more probably in some places than others. Also, quantum theory is about groups of objects, not a single object. The theory does not imply a definite result for a single observation but only for averages over many observations, so this is why quantum theory introduces an inescapable randomness or unpredictability into claims about single objects and single experimental results. The more accurate theory of quantum electrodynamics (QED) that incorporates special relativity and improves on classical quantum theory for the smallest regions, also implies electrons are infinitesimal particles when viewed as particles, while they are wavelike or spread out when viewed as waves. When considering the electron’s particle nature, QED’s prediction of zero volume has been experimentally verified down to the limits of measurement technology. The measurement process is limited by the fact that light or other electromagnetic radiation must be used to locate the electron, and this light cannot be used to determine the position of the electron more accurately than the distance between the wave crests of the light wave used to bombard the electron. So, all this is why the “simple conclusion” mentioned at the beginning of this paragraph may be too simple. For more discussion, see the chapter “The Uncertainty Principle” in (Hawking 2001) or (Greene 1999, pp. 121-2).

If a scientific theory implies space is a continuum, with the structure of a mathematical continuum, then if that theory is taken at face value, space is infinitely divisible and composed of infinitely small entities, the so-called points of space. But should it be taken at face value? The mathematician David Hilbert declared in 1925, “A homogeneous continuum which admits of the sort of divisibility needed to realize the infinitely small is nowhere to be found in reality. The infinite divisibility of a continuum is an operation which exists only in thought.” Many physicists agree with Hilbert, but many others argue that, although Hilbert is correct that ordinary entities such as strawberries and cream are not continuous, he is ultimately incorrect, for the following reasons.

First, the Standard Model of particles and forces is one of the best tested and most successful theories in all the history of physics. So are the theories of relativity and quantum mechanics. All these theories imply or assume that, using Cantor’s technical sense of actual infinity, there are infinitely many infinitesimal instants in any non-zero duration, and there are infinitely many point places along any spatial path. So, time is a continuum, and space is a continuum.

The second challenge to Hilbert’s position is that quantum theory, in agreement with relativity theory, implies that for any possible kinetic energy of a free electron there is half that energy−insofar as an electron can be said to have a value of energy independent of being measured to have it. Although the energy of an electron bound within an atom is quantized, the energy of an unbound or free electron is not. If it accelerates in its reference frame from zero to nearly the speed of light, its energy changes and takes on all intermediate real-numbered values from its rest energy to its total energy. But mass is just a form of energy, as Einstein showed in his famous equation E = mc2, so in this sense mass is a continuum as well as energy.

How about non-classical quantum mechanics, the proposed theories of quantum gravity that are designed to remove the disagreements between quantum mechanics and relativity theory? Do these non-classical theories quantize all these continua we’ve been talking about? One such theory, the theory of loop quantum gravity, implies space consists of discrete units called loops. But string theory, which is the more popular of the theories of quantum gravity in the early 21st century, does not imply space is discontinuous. [See (Greene 2004) for more details.] Speaking about this question of continuity, the theoretical physicist Brian Greene says that, although string theory is developed against a background of continuous spacetime, his own insight is that

[T]he increasingly intense quantum jitters that arise on decreasing scales suggest that the notion of being able to divide distances or durations into ever smaller units likely comes to an end at around the Planck length (10-33centimeters) and Planck time (10-43 seconds). ...There is something lurking in the microdepths−something that might be called the bare-bones substrate of spacetime−the entity to which the familiar notion of spacetime alludes. We expect that this ur-ingredient, this most elemental spacetime stuff, does not allow dissection into ever smaller pieces because of the violent fluctuations that would ultimately be encountered.... [If] familiar spacetime is but a large-scale manifestation of some more fundamental entity, what is that entity and what are its essential properties? As of today, no one knows. (Greene 2004, pp. 473, 474, 477)

Disagreeing, the theoretical physicist Roger Penrose speaks about both loop quantum gravity and string theory and says: the early days of quantum mechanics, there was a great hope, not realized by future developments, that quantum theory was leading physics to a picture of the world in which there is actually discreteness at the tiniest levels. In the successful theories of our present day, as things have turned out, we take spacetime as a continuum even when quantum concepts are involved, and ideas that involve small-scale spacetime discreteness must be regarded as ‘unconventional.’ The continuum still features in an essential way even in those theories which attempt to apply the ideas of quantum mechanics to the very structure of space and time.... Thus it appears, for the time being at least, that we need to take the use of the infinite seriously, particular in its role in the mathematical description of the physical continuum. (Penrose 2005, 363)

b. Singularities

There is a good reason why scientists fear the infinite more than mathematicians do. Scientists have to worry that some day we will have a dangerous encounter with a singularity, with something that is, say, infinitely hot or infinitely dense. For example, we might encounter a singularity by being sucked into a black hole. According to Schwarzschild’s solution to the equations of general relativity, a simple, non-rotating black hole is infinitely dense at its center. For a second example of where there may be singularities, there is good reason to believe that 13.8 billion years ago the entire universe was a singularity with infinite temperature, infinite density, infinitesimal volume, and infinite curvature of spacetime.

Some philosophers will ask: Is it not proper to appeal to our best physical theories in order to learn what is physically possible? Usually, but not in this case, say many scientists, including Albert Einstein. He believed that, if a theory implies that some physical properties might have or, worse yet, do have actually infinite values (the so-called singularities), then this is a sure sign of error in the theory. It’s an error primarily because the theory will be unable to predict the behavior of the infinite entity, and so the theory will fail. For example, even if there were a large, shrinking universe pre-existing the Big Bang, if the Big Bang were considered to be an actual singularity, then knowledge of the state of the universe before the Big Bang could not be used to predict events after the Big Bang, or vice versa. This failure to imply the character of later states of the universe is what Einstein’s collaborator Peter Bergmann meant when he said, “A theory that involves singularities...carries within itself the seeds of its own destruction.” The majority of physicists probably would agree with Einstein and Bergmann about this, but the critics of these scientists say this belief that we need to remove singularities everywhere is merely a hope that has been turned into a metaphysical assumption.

But doesn’t quantum theory also rule out singularities? Yes. Quantum theory allows only arbitrary large, finite values of properties such as temperature and mass-energy density. So which theory, relativity theory or quantum theory, should we trust to tell us whether the center of a black hole is or isn’t a singularity? The best answer is, “Neither, because we should get our answer from a theory of quantum gravity.” A principal attraction of string theory, a leading proposal for a theory of quantum gravity to replace both relativity theory and quantum theory, is that it eliminates the many singularities that appear in previously accepted physical theories such as relativity theory. In string theory, the electrons and quarks are not point particles but are small, finite loops of fundamental string. That finiteness in the loop is what eliminates the singularities.

Unfortunately, string theory has its own problems with infinity. It implies an infinity of kinds of particles. If a particle is a string, then the energy of the particle should be the energy of its vibrating string. Strings have an infinite number of possible vibrational patterns each corresponding to a particle that should exist if we take the theory literally. One response that string theorists make to this problem about too many particles is that perhaps the infinity of particles did exist at the time of the Big Bang but now they have all disintegrated into a shower of simpler particles and so do not exist today. Another response favored by string theorists is that perhaps there never were an infinity of particles nor a Big Bang singularity in the first place. Instead the Big Bang was a Big Bounce or quick expansion from a pre-existing, shrinking universe whose size stopped shrinking when it got below the critical Planck length of about 10-35 meters.

c. Idealization and Approximation

Scientific theories use idealization and approximation; they are "lies that help us to see the truth," to use a phrase from the painter Pablo Picasso (who was speaking about art, not science). In our scientific theories, there are ideal gases, perfectly elliptical orbits, and economic consumers motivated only by profit. Everybody knows these are not intended to be real objects. Yet, it is clear that idealizations and approximations are actually needed in science in order to promote genuine explanation of many phenomena. We need to reduce the noise of the details in order to see what is important. In short, approximations and idealizations can be explanatory. But what about approximations and idealizations that involve the infinite?

Although the terms “idealization” and “approximation” are often used interchangeably, John Norton (Norton 2012) recommends paying more attention to their difference by saying that, when there is some aspect of the world, some target system, that we are trying to understand scientifically, approximations should be considered to be inexact descriptions of the target system whereas idealizations should be considered to be new systems or parts of new systems that also are approximations to the target system but that contain reference to some novel object or property. For example, elliptical orbits are approximations to actual orbits of planets, but ideal gases are idealizations because they contain novel objects such as point particles that are part of a new system that is useful for approximating the target system of actual gases.

All very detailed physical theories are idealizations or approximations to reality that can fail if pushed too far, but some defenders of infinity ask whether all appeals to infinity can be known a priori to be idealizations or approximations. Our theory of the solar system justifies our belief that the Earth is orbited by a moon, not just an approximate moon. The speed of light in a vacuum really is constant, not just approximately constant. Why then should it be assumed, as it often is, that all appeals to infinity in scientific theory are approximations or idealizations? Must the infinity be an artifact of the model rather than a feature of actual physical reality?  Philosophers of science disagree on this issue. See (Mundy, 1990, p. 290).

There is an argument for believing some appeals to infinity definitely are neither approximations nor idealizations. The argument presupposes a realist rather than an antirealist understanding of science, and it begins with a description of the opponents’ position. Carl Friedrich Gauss (1777-1855) was one of the greatest mathematicians of all time. He said scientific theories involve infinities merely as approximations or idealizations and merely in order to make for easy applications of those theories, when in fact all real entities are finite. At the time, nearly everyone would have agreed with Gauss. Roger Penrose argues against Gauss’ position:

Nevertheless, as tried and tested physical theory stands today—as it has for the past 24 centuries—real numbers still form a fundamental ingredient of our understanding of the physical world. (Penrose 2004, 62)

Gauss’ position could be buttressed if there were useful alternatives to our physical theories that do not use infinities. There actually are alternative mathematical theories of analysis that do not use real numbers and do not use infinite sets and do not require the line to be dense. See (Ahmavaara 1965) for an example. Representing the majority position among scientists on this issue, Penrose says, “To my mind, a physical theory which depends fundamentally upon some absurdly enormous...number would be a far more complicated (and improbable) theory than one that is able to depend upon a simple notion of infinity” (Penrose 2005, 359). David Deutsch agrees. He says, “Versions of number theory that confined themselves to ‘small natural numbers’ would have to be so full of arbitrary qualifiers, workarounds and unanswered questions, that they would be very bad explanations until they were generalized to the case that makes sense without such ad-hoc restrictions: the infinite case.” (Deutsch 2011, pp. 118-9) And surely a successful explanation is the surest route to understanding reality.

In opposition to this position of Penrose and Deutsch, and in support of Gauss’ position, the physicist Erwin Schrödinger remarks, “The idea of a continuous range, so familiar to mathematicians in our days, is something quite exorbitant, an enormous extrapolation of what is accessible to us.” Emphasizing this point about being “accessible to us,” some metaphysicians attack the applicability of the mathematical continuum to physical reality on the grounds that a continuous human perception over time is not mathematically continuous. Wesley Salmon responds to this complaint from Schrödinger:

...The perceptual continuum and perceived becoming [that is, the evidence from our sense organs that the world changes from time to time] exhibit a structure radically different from that of the mathematical continuum. Experience does seem, as James and Whitehead emphasize, to have an atomistic character. If physical change could be understood only in terms of the structure of the perceptual continuum, then the mathematical continuum would be incapable of providing an adequate description of physical processes. In particular, if we set the epistemological requirement that physical continuity must be constructed from physical points which are explicitly definable in terms of observables, then it will be impossible to endow the physical continuum with the properties of the mathematical continuum. In our discussion..., we shall see, however, that no such rigid requirement needs to be imposed. (Salmon 1970, 20)

Salmon continues by making the point that calculus provides better explanations of physical change than explanations which accept the “rigid requirement” of understanding physical change in terms of the structure of the perceptual continuum, so he recommends that we apply Ockham’s Razor and eliminate that rigid requirement. But the issue is not settled.

d. Infinity in Cosmology

Let’s review some of the history regarding the volume of spacetime. Aristotle said the past is infinite because, for any past time we can imagine an earlier one. It is difficult to make sense of his belief about the past since he means it is potentially infinite. After all, the past has an end, namely the present, so its infinity has been completed and therefore is not a potential infinity. This problem with Aristotle’s reasoning was first raised in the 13th century by Richard Rufus of Cornwall. It was not given the attention it deserved because of the assumption for so many centuries that Aristotle couldn’t have been wrong about time, especially since his position was consistent with Christian, Jewish, and Muslim theology which implies the physical world became coherent or well-formed only a finite time ago. However Aquinas argued against Aristotle’s view that the past is infinite; Aquinas’ grounds were that Holy Scripture implies God created the world a finite time ago, and that Aristotle was wrong to put so much trust in what we can imagine.

Unlike time, Aristotle claimed space is finite. He said the volume of physical space is finite because it is enclosed within a finite, spherical shell of visible, fixed stars with the Earth at its center. On this topic of space not being infinite, Aristotle’s influence was authoritative to most scholars for the next eighteen hundred years.

The debate about whether the volume of space is infinite was rekindled in Renaissance Europe. The English astronomer and defender of Copernicus, Thomas Digges (1546–1595) was the first scientist to reject the ancient idea of an outer spherical shell and to declare that physical space is actually infinite in volume and filled with stars. The physicist Isaac Newton (1642–1727) at first believed the universe's material is confined to only a finite region while it is surrounded by infinite empty space, but in 1691 he realized that if there were a finite number of stars in a finite region, then gravity would require all the stars to fall in together at some central point. To avoid this result, he later speculated that the universe contains an infinite number of stars in an infinite volume. The notion of infinite time, however, was not accepted by Newton because of conflict with Christian orthodoxy, as influenced by Aquinas. We now know that Newton’s speculation about the stability of an infinity of stars in an infinite universe is incorrect. There would still be clumping so long as the universe did not expand. (Hawking 2001, p. 9)

Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) declared that space and time are both potentially infinite in extent because this is imposed by our own minds. Space and time are not features of “things in themselves” but are an aspect of the very form of any possible human experience, he said. We can know a priori even more about space than about time, he believed; and he declared that the geometry of space must be Euclidean. Kant’s approach to space and time as something knowable a priori went out of fashion in the early 20th century. It was undermined in large part by the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century, then by Beltrami’s and Klein’s proofs that these geometries are as logically consistent as Euclidean geometry, and finally by Einstein’s successful application to physical space of non-Euclidean geometry within his general theory of relativity.

The volume of spacetime is finite at present if we can trust the classical Big Bang theory. [But do not think of this finite space as having a boundary beyond which a traveler falls over the edge into nothingness, or a boundary that cannot be penetrated.] Assuming space is all the places that have been created since the Big Bang, then the volume of space is definitely finite at present, though it is huge and growing ever larger over time. Assuming this expansion will never stop, it follows that the volume of spacetime is potentially infinite but not actually infinite. However, if, as some theorists speculate on the basis of inflationary cosmology, everything that is a product of our Big Bang is just one “bubble” in a sea of bubbles in the infinite spacetime background of the Multiverse, then both space and time are actually infinite. For more discussion of the issue of the infinite volume of spacetime, see (Greene 2011).

In the late nineteenth century, Georg Cantor argued that the mathematical concept of potential infinity presupposes the mathematical concept of actual infinity. This argument was accepted by most later mathematicians, but it does not imply that, if future time were to be potentially infinite, then future time also would be actually infinite.

5. Infinity in Mathematics

The previous sections of this article have introduced the concepts of actual infinity and potential infinity and explored the development of calculus and set theory, but this section will probe deeper into the role of infinity in mathematics. Mathematicians always have been aware of the special difficulty in dealing with the concept of infinity in a coherent manner. Intuitively, it seems reasonable that if we have two infinities of things, then we still have an infinity of them. So, we might represent this intuition mathematically by the equation 2 ∞ = 1 ∞. Dividing both sides by ∞ will prove that 2 = 1, which is a good sign we were not using infinity in a coherent manner. In recommending how to use the concept of infinity coherently, Bertrand Russell said pejoratively:

The whole difficulty of the subject lies in the necessity of thinking in an unfamiliar way, and in realising that many properties which we have thought inherent in number are in fact peculiar to finite numbers. If this is remembered, the positive theory of infinity...will not be found so difficult as it is to those who cling obstinately to the prejudices instilled by the arithmetic which is learnt in childhood. (Salmon 1970, 58)

That positive theory of infinity that Russell is talking about is set theory, and the new arithmetic is the result of Cantor’s generalizing the notions of order and of size of sets into the infinite, that is, to the infinite ordinals and infinite cardinals. These numbers are also called transfinite ordinals and transfinite cardinals. The following sections will briefly explore set theory and the role of infinity within mathematics. The main idea, though, is that the basic theories of mathematical physics are properly expressed using the differential calculus with real-number variables, and these concepts are well-defined in terms of set theory which, in turn, requires using actual infinities or transfinite infinities of various kinds.

a. Infinite Sums

In the 17th century, when Newton and Leibniz invented calculus, they wondered what the value is of this infinite sum:

1/1 + 1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + ....

They believed the sum is 2. Knowing about the dangers of talking about infinity, most later mathematicians hoped to find a technique to avoid using the phrase “infinite sum.” Cauchy and Weierstrass eventually provided this technique two centuries later. They removed any mention of “infinite sum” by using the formal idea of a limit. Informally, the Cauchy-Weierstrass idea is that instead of overtly saying the infinite sum s1 + s2 + s3 + … is some number S, as Newton and Leibniz were saying, one should say that the sequence converges to S just in case the numerical difference between any pair of terms within the sequence is as small as one desires, provided the two terms are sufficiently far out in the sequence. More formally it is expressed this way: The series s1 + s2 + s3 + … converges to S if, and only if, for every positive number ε there exists a number δ such that |sn+h +  sn| < ε for all integers n > δ and all integers h > 0. In this way, reference to an actual infinity has been eliminated.

This epsilon-delta technique of talking about limits was due to Cauchy in 1821 and Weierstrass in the period from 1850 to 1871. The two drawbacks to this technique are that (1) it is unintuitive and more complicated than Newton and Leibniz’s intuitive approach that did mention infinite sums, and (2) it is not needed because infinite sums were eventually legitimized by being given a set-theoretic foundation.

b. Infinitesimals and Hyperreals

There has been considerable controversy throughout history about how to understand infinitesimal objects and infinitesimal changes in the properties of objects. Intuitively an infinitesimal object is as small as you please but not quite nothing. Infinitesimal objects and infinitesimal methods were first used by Archimedes in ancient Greece, but he did not mention them in any publication intended for the public because he did not consider his use of them to be rigorous. Infinitesimals became better known when Leibniz used them in his differential and integral calculus. The differential calculus can be considered to be a technique for treating continuous motion as being composed of an infinite number of infinitesimal steps. The calculus’ use of infinitesimals led to the so-called “golden age of nothing” in which infinitesimals were used freely in mathematics and science. During this period, Leibniz, Euler, and the Bernoullis applied the concept. Euler applied it cavalierly (although his intuition was so good that he rarely if ever made mistakes), but Leibniz and the Bernoullis were concerned with the general question of when we could, and when we could not, consider an infinitesimal to be zero. They were aware of apparent problems with these practices in large part because they had been exposed by Berkeley.

In 1734, George Berkeley attacked the concept of infinitesimal as ill-defined and incoherent because there were no definite rules for when the infinitesimal should be and shouldn’t be considered to be zero. Berkeley, like Leibniz, was thinking of infinitesimals as objects with a constant value--as genuinely infinitesimally small magnitudes--whereas Newton thought of them as variables that could arbitrarily approach zero. Either way, there were coherence problems. The scientists and results-oriented mathematicians of the golden age of nothing had no good answer to the coherence problem. As standards of rigorous reasoning increased over the centuries, mathematicians became more worried about infinitesimals. They were delighted when Cauchy in 1821 and Weierstrass in the period from 1850 to 1875 developed a way to use calculus without infinitesimals, and at this time any appeal to infinitesimals was considered illegitimate, and mathematicians soon stopped using infinitesimals.

Here is how Cauchy and Weierstrass eliminated infinitesimals with their concept of limit. Suppose we have a function f,  and we are interested in the Cartesian graph of the curve y = f(x) at some point a along the x axis. What is the rate of change of  f at a? This is the slope of the tangent line at a, and it is called the derivative f' at a. This derivative was defined by Leibniz to be


where h is an infinitesimal. Because of suspicions about infinitesimals, Cauchy and Weierstrass suggested replacing Leibniz’s definition of the derivative with


That is,  f'(a) is the limit, as x approaches a, of the above ratio. The limit idea was rigorously defined using Cauchy’s well known epsilon and delta method. Soon after the Cauchy-Weierstrass’ definition of derivative was formulated, mathematicians stopped using infinitesimals.

The scientists did not follow the lead of the mathematicians. Despite the lack of a coherent theory of infinitesimals, scientists continued to reason with infinitesimals because infinitesimal methods were so much more intuitively appealing than the mathematicians’ epsilon-delta methods. Although students in calculus classes in the early 21st century are still taught the unintuitive epsilon-delta methods, Abraham Robinson (Robinson 1966) created a rigorous alternative to standard Weierstrassian analysis by using the methods of model theory to define infinitesimals.

Here is Robinson’s idea. Think of the rational numbers in their natural order as being gappy with real numbers filling the gaps between them. Then think of the real numbers as being gappy with hyperreals filling the gaps between them. There is a cloud or region of hyperreals surrounding each real number (that is, surrounding each real number described nonstandardly). To develop these ideas more rigorously, Robinson used this simple definition of an infinitesimal:

h is infinitesimal if and only if 0 < |h| < 1/n, for every positive integer n.

|h| is the absolute value of h.

Robinson did not actually define an infinitesimal as a number on the real line. The infinitesimals were defined on a new number line, the hyperreal line, that contains within it the structure of the standard real numbers from classical analysis. In this sense the hyperreal line is the extension of the reals to the hyperreals. The development of analysis via infinitesimals creates a nonstandard analysis with a hyperreal line and a set of hyperreal numbers that include real numbers. In this nonstandard analysis, 78+2h is a hyperreal that is infinitesimally close to the real number 78. Sums and products of infinitesimals are infinitesimal.

Because of the rigor of the extension, all the arguments for and against Cantor’s infinities apply equally to the infinitesimals. Sentences about the standardly-described reals are true if and only if they are true in this extension to the hyperreals. Nonstandard analysis allows proofs of all the classical theorems of standard analysis, but it very often provides shorter, more direct, and more elegant proofs than those that were originally proved by using standard analysis with epsilons and deltas. Objections by practicing mathematicians to infinitesimals subsided after this was appreciated. With a good definition of “infinitesimal” they could then use it to explain related concepts such as in the sentence, “That curve approaches infinitesimally close to that line.” See (Wolf 2005, chapter 7) for more about infinitesimals and hyperreals.

c. Mathematical Existence

Mathematics is apparently about mathematical objects, so it is apparently about infinitely large objects, infinitely small objects, and infinitely many objects. Mathematicians who are doing mathematics and are not being careful about ontology too easily remark that there are infinite dimensional spaces, the continuum, continuous functions, an infinity of functions, and this or that infinite structure. Do these infinities really exist? The philosophical literature is filled with arguments pro and con and with fine points about senses of existence.

When axiomatizing geometry, Euclid said that between any two points one could choose to construct a line. Opposed to Euclid’s constructivist stance, many modern axiomatizers take a realist philosophical stance by declaring simply that there exists a line between any two points, so the line pre-exists any construction process. In mathematics, the constructivist will recognize the existence of a mathematical object only if there is at present an algorithm (that is, a step by step “mechanical” procedure operating on symbols that is finitely describable, that requires no ingenuity and that uses only finitely many steps) for constructing or finding such an object. Assertions require proofs. The constructivist believes that to justifiably assert the negation of a sentence S is to prove that the assumption of S leads to a contradiction. So, legitimate mathematical objects must be shown to be constructible in principle by some mental activity and cannot be assumed to pre-exist any such construction process nor to exist simply because their non-existence would be contradictory. A constructivist, unlike a realist, is a kind of conceptualist, one who believes that an unknowable mathematical object is impossible. Most constructivists complain that, although potential infinites can be constructed, actual infinities cannot be.

There are many different schools of constructivism. The first systematic one, and perhaps the most well known version and most radical version, is due to L.E.J. Brouwer. He is not a finitist,  but his intuitionist school demands that all legitimate mathematics be constructible from a basis of mental processes he called “intuitions.” These intuitions might be more accurately called “clear mental procedures.” If there were no minds capable of having these intuitions, then there would be no mathematical objects just as there would be no songs without ideas in the minds of composers. Numbers are human creations. The number pi is intuitionistically legitimate because we have an algorithm for computing all its decimal digits, but the following number g is not legitimate: The following number g is illegitimate. It is the number whose nth digit is either 0 or 1, and it is 1 if and only if there are n consecutive 7s in the decimal expansion of pi. No person yet knows how to construct the decimal digits of g. Brouwer argued that the actually infinite set of natural numbers cannot be constructed (using intuitions) and so does not exist. The best we can do is to have a rule for adding more members to a set. So, his concept of an acceptable infinity is closer to that of potential infinity than actual infinity. Hermann Weyl emphasizes the merely potential character of these infinities:

Brouwer made it clear, as I think beyond any doubt, that there is no evidence supporting the belief in the existential character of the totality of all natural numbers…. The sequence of numbers which grows beyond any stage already reached by passing to the next number, is a manifold of possibilities open towards infinity; it remains forever in the status of creation, but is not a closed realm of things existing in themselves. (Weyl is quoted in (Kleene 1967, p. 195))

It is not legitimate for platonic realists, said Brouwer, to bring all the sets into existence at once by declaring they are whatever objects satisfy all the axioms of set theory. Brouwer believed realists accept too many sets because they are too willing to accept sets merely by playing coherently with the finite symbols for them when sets instead should be tied to our experience. For Brouwer this experience is our experience of time. He believed we should arrive at our concept of the infinite by noticing that our experience of a duration can be divided into parts and then these parts can be further divided, and so. This infinity is a potential infinity, not an actual infinity. For the intuitionist, there is no determinate, mind-independent mathematical reality which provides the facts to make mathematical sentences true or false. This metaphysical position is reflected in the principles of logic that are acceptable to an intuitionist. For the intuitionist, the sentence “For all x, x has property F” is true only if we have already proved constructively that each x has property F. And it is false only if we have proved that some x does not have property F. Otherwise, it is neither true nor false. The intuitionist does not accept the principle of excluded middle: For any sentence S, either S or the negation of S. Outraged by this intuitionist position, David Hilbert famously responded by saying, “To take the law of the excluded middle away from the mathematician would be like denying the astronomer the telescope or the boxer the use of his fists.” (quoted from Kleene 1967, p. 197) For a presentation of intuitionism with philosophical emphasis, see (Posy 2005) and (Dummett 1977).

Finitists, even those who are not constructivists, also argue that the actually infinite set of natural numbers does not exist. They say there is a finite rule for generating each numeral from the previous one, but the rule does not produce an actual infinity of either numerals or numbers. The ultrafinitist considers the classical finitist to be too liberal because finite numbers such as 2100 and 21000 can never be accessed by a human mind in a reasonable amount of time. Only the numerals or symbols for those numbers can be coherently manipulated. One challenge to ultrafinitists is that they should explain where the cutoff point is between numbers that can be accessed and numbers that cannot be. Ultrafinitsts have risen to this challenge. The mathematician Harvey Friedman says:

I raised just this objection [about a cutoff] with the (extreme) ultrafinitist Yessenin-Volpin during a lecture of his. He asked me to be more specific. I then proceeded to start with 21 and asked him whether this is “real” or something to that effect. He virtually immediately said yes. Then I asked about 22, and he again said yes, but with a perceptible delay. Then 23, and yes, but with more delay. This continued for a couple of more times, till it was obvious how he was handling this objection. Sure, he was prepared to always answer yes, but he was going to take 2100 times as long to answer yes to 2100 than he would to answering 21. There is no way that I could get very far with this. (Elwes 2010, 317)

This battle among competing philosophies of mathematics will not be explored in depth in this article, but this section will offer a few more points about mathematical existence.

Hilbert argued that, “If the arbitrarily given axioms do not contradict one another, then they are true and the things defined by the axioms exist.” But (Chihara 2008, 141) points out that Hilbert seems to be confusing truth with truth in a model. If a set of axioms is consistent, and so is its corresponding axiomatic theory, then the theory defines a class of models, and each axiom is true in any such model, but it does not follow that the axioms are really true. To give a crude, nonmathematical example, consider this set of two axioms {All horses are blue, all cows are green.}. The formal theory using these axioms is consistent and has a model, but it does not follow that either axiom is really true.

Quine objected to Hilbert's criterion for existence as being too liberal. Quine’s argument for infinity in mathematics begins by noting that our fundamental scientific theories are our best tools for helping us understand reality and doing ontology. Mathematical theories which imply the existence of some actually infinite sets are indispensable to all these scientific theories, and their referring to these infinities cannot be paraphrased away. All this success is a good reason to believe in some actual infinite sets and to say the sentences of both the mathematical theories and the scientific theories are true or approximately true since their success would otherwise be a miracle. But, he continues, of course it is no miracle. See (Quine 1960 chapter 7).

Quine believed that infinite sets exist only if they are indispensable in successful applications of mathematics to science; but he believed science so far needs only the first three alephs: ℵ0 for the integers, ℵ1 for the set of point places in space, and ℵ2 for the number of possible lines in space (including lines that are not continuous). The rest of Cantor’s heaven of transfinite numbers is unreal, Quine said, and the mathematics of the extra transfinite numbers is merely “recreational mathematics.” But Quine showed intellectual flexibility by saying that if he were to be convinced more transfinite sets were needed in science, then he’d change his mind about which alephs are real. To briefly summarize Quine’s position, his indispensability argument treats mathematical entities on a par with all other theoretical entities in science and says mathematical statements can be (approximately) true. Quine points out that reference to mathematical entities is vital to science, and there is no way of separating out the evidence for the mathematics from the evidence for the science. This famous indispensability argument has been attacked in many ways. Critics charge, “Quite aside from the intrinsic logical defects of set theory as a deductive theory, this is disturbing because sets are so very different from physical objects as ordinarily conceived, and because the axioms of set theory are so very far removed from any kind of empirical support or empirical testability…. Not even set theory itself can tell us how the existence of a set (e.g. a power set) is empirically manifested.” (Mundy 1990, pp. 289-90). See (Parsons 1980) for more details about Quine’s and other philosophers’ arguments about existence of mathematical objects.

d. Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory

Cantor initially thought of a set as being a collection of objects that can be counted, but this notion eventually gave way to a set being a collection that has a clear membership condition. Over several decades, Cantor’s naive set theory evolved into ZF, Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory, and ZF was accepted by most mid-20th century mathematicians as the correct tool to use for deciding which mathematical objects exist. The acceptance was based on three reasons. (1) ZF is precise and rigorous. (2) ZF is useful for defining or representing other mathematical concepts and methods. Mathematics can be modeled in set theory; it can be given a basis in set theory. (3) No inconsistency has been uncovered despite heavy usage.

Notice that one of the three reasons is not that set theory provides a foundation to mathematics in the sense of justifying the doing of mathematics or in the sense of showing its sentences are certain or necessary. Instead, set theory provides a basis for theories only in the sense that it helps to organize them, to reveal their interrelationships, and to provide a means to precisely define their concepts. The first program for providing this basis began in the late 19th century. Peano had given an axiomatization of the natural numbers. It can be expressed in set theory using standard devices for treating natural numbers and relations and functions and so forth as being sets. (For example, zero is the empty set, and a relation is a set of ordered pairs.) Then came the arithmetization of analysis which involved using set theory to construct from the natural numbers all the negative numbers and the fractions and real numbers and complex numbers. Along with this, the principles of these numbers became sentences of set theory. In this way, the assumptions used in informal reasoning in arithmetic are explicitly stated in the formalism, and proofs in informal arithmetic can be rewritten as formal proofs so that no creativity is required for checking the correctness of the proofs. Once a mathematical theory is given a set theoretic basis in this manner, it follows that if we have any philosophical concerns about the higher level mathematical theory, those concerns will also be concerns about the lower level set theory in the basis.

In addition to Dedekind’s definition, there are other acceptable definitions of "infinite set" and "finite set" using set theory. One popular one is to define a finite set as a set onto which a one-to-one function maps the set of all natural numbers that are less than some natural number n. That finite set contains n elements. An infinite set is then defined as one that is not finite. Dedekind, himself, used another definition; he defined an infinite set as one that is not finite, but defined a finite set as any set in which there exists no one-to-one mapping of the set into a proper subset of itself. The philosopher C. S. Peirce suggested essentially the same approach as Dedekind at approximately the same time, but he received little notice from the professional community. For more discussion of the details, see (Wilder 1965, p. 66f, and Suppes 1960, p. 99n).

Set theory implies quite a bit about infinity. First, infinity in ZF has some very unsurprising features. If a set A is infinite and is the same size as set B, then B also is infinite. If A is infinite and is a subset of B, then B also is infinite. Using the axiom of choice, it follows that a set is infinite just in case for every natural number n, there is some subset whose size is n.

ZF’s axiom of infinity declares that there is at least one infinite set, a so-called inductive set containing zero and the successor of each of its members (such as {0, 1, 2, 3, …}). The power set axiom (which says every set has a power set, namely a set of all its subsets) then generates many more infinite sets of larger cardinality, a surprising result that Cantor first discovered in 1874.

In ZF, there is no set with maximum cardinality, nor a set of all sets, nor an infinitely descending sequence of sets x0, x1, x2, ... in which x1 is in x0, and x2 is in x1, and so forth. There is however, an infinitely ascending sequence of sets x0, x1, x2, ... in which x0 is in x1, and x1 is in x2, and so forth. In ZF, a set exists if it is implied by the axioms; there is no requirement that there be some property P such that the set is the extension of P. That is, there is no requirement that the set be defined as {x| P(x)} for some property P. One especially important feature of ZF is that for any condition or property, there is only one set of objects having that property, but it cannot be assumed that for any property, there is a set of all those objects that have that property. For example, it cannot be assumed that, for the property of being a set, there is a set of all objects having that property.

In ZF, all sets are pure. A set is pure if it is empty or its members are sets, and its members' members are sets, and so forth. In informal set theory, a set can contain cows and electrons and other non-sets.

In the early years of set theory, the terms "set" and "class" and “collection” were used interchangeably, but in von Neumann–Bernays–Gödel set theory (NBG or VBG) a set is defined to be a class that is an element of some other class. NBG is designed to have proper classes, classes that are not sets, even though they can have members which are sets. The intuitive idea is that a proper class is a collection that is too big to be a set. There can be a proper class of all sets, but neither a set of all sets nor a class of all classes. A nice feature of NBG is that a sentence in the language of ZFC is provable in NBG only if it is provable in ZFC.

Are philosophers justified in saying there is more to know about sets than is contained within ZF set theory? If V is the collection or class of all sets, do mathematicians have any access to V independently of the axioms? This is an open question that arose concerning the axiom of choice and the continuum hypothesis.

e. The Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis

Consider whether to believe in the axiom of choice. The axiom of choice is the assertion that, given any collection of non-empty and non-overlapping sets, there exists a ‘choice set’ which is composed of one element chosen from each set in the collection. However, the axiom does not say how to do the choosing. For some sets there might not be a precise rule of choice. If the collection is infinite and its sets are not well-ordered in any way that has been specified, then there is in general no way to define the choice set. The axiom is implicitly used throughout the field of mathematics, and several important theorems cannot be proved without it. Mathematical Platonists tend to like the axiom, but those who want explicit definitions or constructions for sets do not like it. Nor do others who note that mathematics’ most unintuitive theorem, the Banach-Tarski Theorem, requires the axiom of choice. The dispute can get quite intense with advocates of the axiom of choice saying that their opponents are throwing out invaluable mathematics, while these opponents consider themselves to be removing tainted mathematics. See (Wagon 1985) for more on the Banach-Tarski Theorem; see (Wolf 2005, pp. 226-8) for more discussion of which theorems require the axiom.

A set is always smaller than its power set. How much bigger is the power set? Cantor’s controversial continuum hypothesis says that the cardinality of the power set of ℵ0 is ℵ1, the next larger cardinal number, and not some higher cardinal. The generalized continuum hypothesis is more general; it says that, given an infinite set of any cardinality, the cardinality of its power set is the next larger cardinal and not some even higher cardinal. Cantor believed the continuum hypothesis is true, but he was frustrated that he could not prove it. The philosophical issue is whether we should alter the axioms to enable the hypotheses to be proved.

If ZF is formalized as a first-order theory of deductive logic, then both Cantor’s generalized continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice are consistent with the other principles of set theory but cannot be proved or disproved from them, assuming that ZF is not inconsistent. In this sense, both the continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice are independent of ZF. Gödel in 1940 and Cohen in 1964 contributed to the proof of this independence result.

So, how do we decide whether to believe the axiom of choice and continuum hypothesis, and how do we decide whether to add them to the principles of ZF or any other set theory? Most mathematicians do believe the axiom of choice is true, but there is more uncertainty about the continuum hypothesis. The independence does not rule out our someday finding a convincing argument that the hypothesis is true or a convincing argument that it is false, but the argument will need more premises than just the principles of ZF. At this point the philosophers of mathematics divide into two camps. The realists, who think there is a unique universe of sets to be discovered, believe that if ZF does not fix the truth values of the continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice, then this is a defect within ZF and we need to explore our intuitions about infinity in order to uncover a missing axiom or two for ZF that will settle the truth values. These persons prefer to think that there is a single system of mathematics to which set theory is providing a foundation, but they would prefer not simply to add the continuum hypothesis itself as an axiom because the hope is to make the axioms "readily believable," yet it is not clear enough that the axiom itself is readily believable. The second camp of philosophers of mathematics disagree and say the concept of infinite set is so vague that we simply do not have any intuitions that will or should settle the truth values. According to this second camp, there are set theories with and without axioms that fix the truth values of the axiom of choice and the continuum hypothesis, and set theory should no more be a unique theory of sets than Euclidean geometry should be the unique theory of geometry.

Believing that ZFC’s infinities are merely the above-surface part of the great iceberg of infinite sets, many set theorists are actively exploring new axioms that imply the existence of sets that could not be proved to exist within ZFC. So far there is no agreement among researchers about the acceptability of any of the new axioms. See (Wolf 2005, pp. 226-8) and (Rucker 1982) pp. 252-3 for more discussion of the search for these new axioms.

6. Infinity in Deductive Logic

The infinite appears in many interesting ways in formal deductive logic, and this section presents an introduction to a few of those ways. Among all the various kinds of formal deductive logics, first-order logic (the usual predicate logic) stands out as especially important, in part because of the accuracy and detail with which it can mirror mathematical deductions. First-order logic also stands out because it is the strongest logic that has a proof for every one of its logically true sentences, and that is compact in the sense that if an infinite set of its sentences is inconsistent, then so is some finite subset.

But just what is first-order logic? To answer this and other questions, it is helpful to introduce some technical terminology. Here is a chart of what is ahead:

First-order language First-order theory First-order formal system First-order logic
Definition Formal language with quantifiers over objects but not over sets of objects. A set of sentences expressed in a first-order language. First-order theory plus its method for building proofs. First-order language with its method for building proofs.

A first-order theory is a set of sentences expressed in a first-order language (which will be defined below). A first-order formal system is a first-order theory plus its deductive structure (method of building proofs). The term “first-order logic” is ambiguous. It can mean a first-order language with its deductive structure, or it can mean simply the academic subject or discipline that studies first-order languages and theories.

Classical first-order logic is distinguished by its satisfying certain classically-accepted assumptions: that it has only two truth values; in an interpretation or valuation [note: the terminology is not standardized] , every sentence gets exactly one of the two truth values; no well-formed formula (wff) can contain an infinite number of symbols; a valid deduction cannot be made from true sentences to a false one; deductions cannot be infinitely long; the domain of an interpretation cannot be empty but can have any infinite cardinality; an individual constant (name) must name something in the domain; and so forth.

A formal language specifies the language’s vocabulary symbols and its syntax, primarily what counts as being a term or name and what are its well-formed formulas (wffs). A first-order language is a formal language whose symbols are the quantifiers (∃), connectives (↔), constants (a), variables (x), predicates or relations (R), and perhaps functions (f) and equality (=). It has a denumerable list of variables. (A set is denumerable or countably infinite if it has size ℵ0.) A first-order language has a countably finite or countably infinite number of predicate symbols and function symbols, but not a zero number of both. First-order languages differ from each other only in their predicate symbols or function symbols or constants symbols or in having or not having the equality symbol. See (Wolf 2005, p. 23) for more details. Every wff in a first-order language must contain only finitely many symbols. There are denumerably many terms, formulas, and sentences. Because there are uncountably many real numbers, a theory of real numbers in a first-order language does not have enough names for all the real numbers.

To carry out proofs or deductions in a first-order language, the language needs to be given a deductive structure. There are several different ways to do this (via axioms, natural deduction, sequent calculus), but the ways all are independent of which first-order language is being used, and they all require specifying rules such as modus ponens for how to deduce wffs from finitely many previous wffs in the deduction.

To give some semantics or meaning to its symbols, the first-order language needs a definition of valuation and of truth in a valuation and of validity of an argument. In a propositional logic, the valuation assigns to each sentence letter a single truth value; in predicate logic each term is given a denotation, and each predicate is given a set of objects in the domain that satisfy the predicate. The valuation rules then determine the truth values of all the wffs. The valuation’s domain is a set containing all the objects that the terms might denote and that the variables range over. The domain may be of any finite or transfinite size, but the variables can range only over objects in this domain, not over sets of those objects.

Because a first-order language cannot successfully express sentences that generalize over sets (or properties or classes or relations) of the objects in the domain, it cannot, for example, adequately express Leibniz’s Law that, “If objects a and b are identical, then they have the same properties.” A second-order language can do this. A language is second-order if in addition to quantifiers on variables that range over objects in the domain it also has quantifiers (such as œthe universal quantifier ∀P) on a second kind of variable P that ranges over properties (or classes or relations) of these objects. Here is one way to express Leibniz’s Law in second-order logic:

(a = b) --> ∀P(Pa ↔ Pb)

P is called a predicate variable or property variable. Every valid deduction in first-order logic is also valid in second-order logic. A language is third-order if it has quantifiers on variables that range over properties of properties of objects (or over sets of sets of objects), and so forth. A language is called higher-order if it is at least second-order.

The definition of first-order theory given earlier in this section was that it is any set of wffs in a first-order language. A more ordinary definition adds that it is closed under deduction. This additional requirement implies that every deductive consequence of some sentences of the theory also is in the theory. Since the consequences are countably infinite, all ordinary first-order theories are countably infinite.

If the language isn’t explicitly mentioned for a first-order theory, then it is generally assumed that the language is the smallest first-order language that contains all the sentences of the theory. Valuations of the language in which all the sentences of the theory are true are said to be models of the theory.

If the theory is axiomatized, then in addition to the logical axioms there are proper axioms (also called non-logical axioms); these axioms are specific to the theory (and so usually do not hold in other first-order theories). For example, Peano’s axioms when expressed in a first-order language are proper axioms for the formal theory of arithmetic, but they aren't logical axioms or logical truths. See (Wolf, 2005, pp. 32-3) for specific proper axioms of Peano Arithmetic and for proofs of some of its important theorems.

Besides the above problem about Leibniz’s Law, there is a related problem about infinity that occurs when Peano Arithmetic is expressed as a first-order theory. Gödel’s First Incompleteness Theorem proves that there are some bizarre truths which are independent of first-order Peano Arithmetic (PA), and so cannot be deduced within PA. None of these truths so far are known to lie in mainstream mathematics. But they might. And there is another reason to worry about the limitations of PA. Because the set of sentences of PA is only countable, whereas there are uncountably many sets of numbers in informal arithmetic, it might be that PA is inadequate for expressing and proving some important theorems about sets of numbers. See (Wolf 2005, pp. 33-4, 225).

It seems that all the important theorems of arithmetic and the rest of mathematics can be expressed and proved in another first-order theory, Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the axiom of choice (ZFC). Unlike first-order Peano Arithmetic, ZFC needs only a very simple first-order language that surprisingly has no undefined predicate symbol, equality symbol, relation symbol, or function symbol, other than a single two-place binary relation symbol intended to represent set membership. The domain is intended to be composed only of sets but since mathematical objects can be defined to be sets, the domain contains these mathematical objects.

a. Finite and Infinite Axiomatizability

In the process of axiomatizing a theory, any sentence of the theory can be called an axiom. When axiomatizing a theory, there is no problem with having an infinite number of axioms so long as the set of axioms is decidable, that is, so long as there is a finitely long computation or mechanical procedure for deciding, for any sentence, whether it is an axiom.

Logicians are curious as to which formal theories can be finitely axiomatized in a given formal system and which can only be infinitely axiomatized. Group theory is finitely axiomatizable in classical first-order logic, but Peano Arithmetic and ZFC are not. Peano Arithmetic is not finitely axiomatizable because it requires an axiom scheme for induction. An axiom scheme is a countably infinite number of axioms of similar form, and an axiom scheme for induction would be an infinite number of axioms of the form (expressed here informally): “If property P of natural numbers holds for zero, and also holds for n+1 whenever it holds for natural number n, then P holds for all natural numbers.” There needs to be a separate axiom for every property P, but there is a countably infinite number of these properties expressible in a first-order language of elementary arithmetic.

Assuming ZF is consistent, ZFC is not finitely axiomatizable in first-order logic, as Richard Montague discovered. Nevertheless ZFC is a subset of von Neumann–Bernays–Gödel (NBG) set theory, and the latter is finitely axiomatizable, as Paul Bernays discovered. The first-order theory of Euclidean geometry is not finitely axiomatizable, and the second-order logic used in (Field 1980) to reconstruct mathematical physics without quantifying over numbers also is not finitely axiomatizable. See (Mendelson 1997) for more discussion of finite axiomatizability.

b. Infinitely Long Formulas

An infinitary logic is a logic that makes one of classical logic’s necessarily finite features be infinite. In the languages of classical first-order logic, every formula is required to be only finitely long, but an infinitary logic might relax this. The original, intuitive idea behind requiring finitely long sentences in classical logic was that logic should reflect the finitude of the human mind. But with increasing opposition to psychologism in logic, that is, to making logic somehow dependent on human psychology, researchers began to ignore the finitude restrictions. Löwenheim in about 1915 was perhaps the pioneer here. In 1957, Alfred Tarski and Dana Scott explored permitting the operations of conjunction and disjunction to link infinitely many formulas into an infinitely long formula. Tarski also suggested allowing formulas to have a sequence of quantifiers of any transfinite length. William Hanf proved in 1964 that, unlike classical logics, these infinitary logics fail to be compact. See (Barwise 1975) for more discussion of these developments.

c. Infinitely Long Proofs

Classical formal logic requires proofs to contain a finite number of steps. In the mid-20th century with the disappearance of psychologism in logic, researchers began to investigate logics with infinitely long proofs as an aid to simplifying consistency proofs. See (Barwise 1975).

d. Infinitely Many Truth Values

One reason for permitting an infinite number of truth values is to represent the idea that truth is a matter of degree. The intuitive idea is that, say, depending on the temperature, the truth of “This cup of coffee is warm” might be definitely true, less true, even less true, and so forth

One of the simplest infinite-valued semantics uses a continuum of truth values. Its valuations assign to each basic sentence (a formal sentence that contains no connectives or quantifiers) a truth value that is a specific number in the closed interval of real numbers from 0 to 1. The truth value of the vague sentence “This water is warm” is understood to be definitely true if it has the truth value 1 and definitely false if it has the truth value 0. To sentences having main connectives, the valuation assigns to the negation ~P of any sentence P the truth value of one minus the truth value assigned to P. It assigns to the conjunction P & Q the minimum of the truth values of P and of Q. It assigns to the disjunction P v Q the maximum of the truth values of P and of Q, and so forth.

One advantage to using an infinite-valued semantics is that by permitting modus ponens to produce a conclusion that is slightly less true than either premise, we can create a solution to the paradox of the heap, the sorites paradox. One disadvantage is that there is no well-motivated choice for the specific real number that is the truth value of a vague statement. What is the truth value appropriate to “This water is warm” when the temperature is 100 degrees Fahrenheit and you are interested in cooking pasta in it? Is the truth value 0.635? This latter problem of assigning truth values to specific sentences without being arbitrary has led to the development of fuzzy logics in place of the simpler infinite-valued semantics we have been considering. Lofti Zadeh suggested that instead of vague sentences having any of a continuum of precise truth values we should make the continuum of truth values themselves imprecise. His suggestion was to assign a sentence a truth value that is a fuzzy set of numerical values, a set for which membership is a matter of degree. For more details, see (Nolt 1997, pp. 420-7).

e. Infinite Models

A countable language is a language with countably many symbols. The Löwenhim Skolem Theorem says:

If a first-order theory in a countable language has an infinite model, then it has a countably infinite model.

This is a surprising result about infinity. Would you want your theory of real numbers to have a countable model? Strictly speaking it is a puzzle and not a paradox because the property of being countably infinite is a property it has when viewed from outside the object language not within it. The theorem does not imply first-order theories of real numbers must have no more real numbers than there are natural numbers.

The Löwenhim-Skolem Theorem can be extended to say that if a theory in a countable language has a model of some infinite size, then it also has models of any infinite size. This is a limitation on first-order theories; they do not permit having a categorical theory of an infinite structure.  A formal theory is said to be categorical if any two models satisfying the theory are isomorphic. The two models are isomorphic if they have the same structure; and they can’t be isomorphic if they have different sizes. So, if you create a first-order theory intended to describe a single infinite structure of a certain size, the theory will end up having, for any infinite size, a model of that size. This frustrates the hopes of anyone who would like to have a first-order theory of arithmetic that has models only of size ℵ0, and to have a first-order theory of real numbers that has models only of size 20.  See (Enderton 1972, pp. 142-3) for more discussion of this limitation.

Because of this limitation, many logicians have turned to second-order logics. There are second-order categorical theories for the natural numbers and for the real numbers. Unfortunately, there is no sound and complete deductive structure for any second-order logic having a decidable set of axioms; this is a major negative feature of second-order logics.

To illustrate one more surprise regarding infinity in formal logic, notice that the quantifiers are defined in terms of their domain, the domain of discourse. In a first-order set theory, the expression ∃xPx says there exists some set x in the infinite domain of all the sets such that x has property P. Unfortunately, in ZF there is no set of all sets to serve as this domain. So, it is oddly unclear what the expression ∃xPx means when we intend to use it to speak about sets.

f. Infinity and Truth

According to Alfred Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem, in an arbitrary first-order language a global truth predicate is not definable. A global truth predicate is a predicate which is satisfied by all and only the names (via, say, Gödel numbering) of all the true sentences of the formal language. According to Tarski, since no single language has a global truth predicate, the best approach to expressing truth formally within the language is to expand the  language into an infinite hierarchy of languages, with each higher language (the metalanguage) containing a truth predicate that can apply to all and only the true sentences of languages lower in the hierarchy. This process is iterated into the transfinite to obtain Tarski's hierarchy of metalanguages. Some philosophers have suggested that this infinite hierarchy is implicit within natural languages such as English, but other philosophers, including Tarski himself, believe an informal language does not contain within it a formal language.

To handle the concept of truth formally, Saul Kripke rejects the infinite hierarchy of metalanguages in favor of an infinite hierarchy of interpretations (that is, valuations) of a single language, such as a first-order predicate calculus, with enough apparatus to discuss its own syntax. The language’s intended truth predicate T is the only basic (atomic) predicate that is ever partially-interpreted at any stage of the hierarchy. At the first step in the hierarchy, all predicates but the single predicate T(x) are interpreted. T(x) is completely uninterpreted at this level. As we go up the hierarchy, the interpretation of the other basic predicates are unchanged, but T is satisfied by the names of sentences that were true at lower levels. For example, at the second level, T is satisfied by the name of the sentence ∀œx(Fx v ~Fx). At each step in the hierarchy, more sentences get truth values, but any sentence that has a truth value at one level has that same truth value at all higher levels. T almost becomes a global truth predicate when the inductive interpretation-building reaches the first so-called fixed point level. At this countably infinite level, although T is a truth predicate for all those sentences having one of the two classical truth values, the predicate is not quite satisfied by the names of every true sentence because it is not satisfied by the names of some of the true sentences containing T. At this fixed point level, the Liar sentence (of the Liar Paradox) is still neither true nor false. For this reason, the Liar sentence is said to fall into a “truth gap” in Kripke’s theory of truth. See (Kripke, 1975).

(Yablo 1993) produced a semantic paradox somewhat like the Liar Paradox. Yablo claimed there is no way to coherently assign a truth value to any of the sentences in the countably infinite sequence of sentences of the form, “None of the subsequent sentences are true.” Ask yourself whether the first sentence in the sequence could be true. Notice that no sentence overtly refers to itself. There is controversy in the literature about whether the paradox actually contains a hidden appeal to self-reference, and there has been some investigation of the parallel paradox in which “true” is replaced by “provable.” See (Beall 2001).

7. Conclusion

There are many aspects of the infinite that this article does not cover. Here are some of them: renormalization in quantum field theory, supertasks and infinity machines, categorematic and syncategorematic uses of the word “infinity,” mereology, ordinal and cardinal arithmetic in ZF, the various non-ZF set theories, non-standard solutions to Zeno's Paradoxes, Cantor's arguments for the Absolute, Kant’s views on the infinite, quantifiers that assert the existence of uncountably many objects, and the detailed arguments for and against constructivism, intuitionism, and finitism. For more discussion of these latter three programs, see (Maddy 1992).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ahmavaara, Y. (1965). “The Structure of Space and the Formalism of Relativistic Quantum Theory,” Journal of Mathematical Physics, 6, 87-93.
    • Uses finite arithmetic in mathematical physics, and argues that this is the correct arithmetic for science.
  • Barrow, John D. (2005). The Infinite Book: A Short Guide to the Boundless, Timeless and Endless. Pantheon Books, New York.
    • An informal and easy-to-understand survey of the infinite in philosophy, theology, science and mathematics. Says which Western philosopher throughout the centuries said what about infinity.
  • Barwise, Jon. (1975) “Infinitary Logics,” in Modern Logic: A Survey, E. Agazzi (ed.), Reidel, Dordrecht, pp. 93-112.
    • An introduction to infinitary logics that emphasizes historical development.
  • Beall, J.C. (2001). “Is Yablo’s Paradox Non-Circular?” Analysis 61, no. 3, pp. 176-87.
    • Discusses the controversy over whether the Yablo Paradox is or isn’t indirectly circular.
  • Cantor, Georg. (1887). "Über die verschiedenen Ansichten in Bezug auf die actualunendlichen Zahlen." Bihang till Kongl. Svenska Vetenskaps-Akademien Handlingar , Bd. 11 (1886-7), article 19. P. A. Norstedt & Sôner: Stockholm.
    • A very early description of set theory and its relationship to old ideas about infinity.
  • Chihara, Charles. (1973). Ontology and the Vicious-Circle Principle. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • Pages 63-65 give Chihara’s reasons for why the Gödel-Cohen independence results are evidence against mathematical Platonism.
  • Chihara, Charles. (2008). “The Existence of Mathematical Objects,” in Proof & Other Dilemmas: Mathematics and Philosophy, Bonnie Gold & Roger A. Simons, eds., The Mathematical Association of America.
    • In chapter 7, Chihara provides a fine survey of the ontological issues in mathematics.
  • Deutsch, David. (2011). The Beginning of Infinity: Explanations that Transform the World. Penguin Books, New York City.
    • Emphasizes the importance of successful explanation in understanding the world, and provides new ideas on the nature and evolution of our knowledge.
  • Descartes, René. (1641). Meditations on First Philosophy.
    • The third meditation says, “But these properties [of God] are so great and excellent, that the more attentively I consider them the less I feel persuaded that the idea I have of them owes its origin to myself alone. And thus it is absolutely necessary to conclude, from all that I have before said, that God exists….”
  • Dummett, Michael. (1977). Elements of Intuitionism. Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • A philosophically rich presentation of intuitionism in logic and mathematics.
  • Elwes, Richard. (2010). Mathematics 1001: Absolutely Everything That Matters About Mathematics in 1001 Bite-Sized Explanations, Firefly Books, Richmond Hill, Ontario.
    • Contains the quoted debate between Harvey Friedman and a leading ultrafinitist.
  • Enderton, Herbert B. (1972). A Mathematical Introduction to Logic. Academic Press: New York.
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    • The quantum field theory called quantum electrodynamics (QED) is discussed on pp. 121-2.
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    • Chapter 4 of Brief History contains an elementary and non-mathematical introduction to quantum mechanics and Heisenberg’s uncertainty principle.
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    • Leibniz defends the actual infinite in calculus.
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    • A discussion of the varieties of realism in mathematics and the defenses that have been, and could be, offered for them. The book is an extended argument for realism about mathematical objects. She offers a set theoretic monism in which all physical objects are sets.
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    • A survey of many of the issues discussed in this encyclopedia article.
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    • Pp. 225–86 discuss NBG set theory.
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    • Mill argues for empiricism and against accepting the references of theoretical terms in scientific theories if the terms can be justified only by the explanatory success of those theories.
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    • A popular survey of the infinite in metaphysics, mathematics, and science.
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    • Discusses the relationships among set theory, logic and physics.
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    • An undergraduate logic textbook containing in later chapters a brief introduction to non-standard logics such as those with infinite-valued semantics.
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    • Recommends being careful about the distinction between approximation and idealization in science.
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    • This survey of the topic is still reliable.
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    • A fascinating book about the relationship between mathematics and physics. Many of its chapters assume sophistication in advanced mathematics.
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    • The history of the intuitionism of Brouwer, Heyting and Dummett. Pages 330-1 explain how Brouwer uses choice sequences to develop “even the infinity needed to produce a continuum” non-empirically.
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    • Chapter 7 introduces Quine’s viewpoint that set theoretic objects exist because they are needed in the basis of our best scientific theories.
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    • Contains the quotation saying infinite sets exist only insofar as they are needed for scientific theory.
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    • Robinson’s original theory of the infinitesimal and its use in real analysis to replace the Cauchy-Weierstrass methods that use epsilons and deltas.
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    • Russell champions the use of contemporary real analysis and physics in resolving Zeno’s paradoxes. Chapter 6 is “The Problem of Infinity Considered Historically,” and that chapter is reproduced in (Salmon, 1970).
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    • The unintuitive Banach-Tarski Theorem says a solid sphere can be decomposed into a finite number of parts and then reassembled into two solid spheres of the same radius as the original sphere. Unfortunately you cannot double your sphere of solid gold this way.
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    • Chapters 2 and 6 describe set theory and its historical development. Both the history of the infinitesimal and the development of Robinson’s nonstandard model of analysis are described clearly on pages 280-316.
  • Yablo, Stephen. (1993). “Paradox without Self-Reference.” Analysis 53: 251-52.
    • Yablo presents a Liar-like paradox involving an infinite sequence of sentences that, the author claims, is “not in any way circular,” unlike with the traditional Liar Paradox.


Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.

Dynamic Epistemic Logic

This article tells the story of the rise of dynamic epistemic logic, which began with epistemic logic, the logic of knowledge, in the 1960s. Then, in the late 1980s, came dynamic epistemic logic, the logic of change of knowledge. Much of it was motivated by puzzles and paradoxes. The number of active researchers in these logics grows significantly every year, possibly because there are so many relations and applications to computer science, to multi-agent systems, to philosophy, and to cognitive science. The modal knowledge operators in epistemic logic are formally interpreted by employing binary accessibility relations in multi-agent Kripke models (relational structures), where these relations should be equivalence relations to respect the properties of knowledge.

The operators for change of knowledge correspond to another sort of modality, more akin to a dynamic modality. A peculiarity of this dynamic modality is that it is interpreted by transforming the Kripke structures used to interpret knowledge, and not, at least not on first sight, by an accessibility relation given with a Kripke model. Although called dynamic epistemic logic, this two-sorted modal logic applies to more general settings than the logic of merely S5 knowledge. The present article discusses in depth the early history of dynamic epistemic logic. It then mentions briefly a number of more recent developments involving factual change, one (of several) standard translations to temporal epistemic logic, and a relation to situation calculus (a well-known framework in artificial intelligence to represent change). Special attention is then given to the relevance of dynamic epistemic logic for belief revision, for speech act theory, and for philosophical logic. The part on philosophical logic pays attention to Moore sentences, the Fitch paradox, and the Surprise Examination.

For the main body of this article, go to Dynamic Epistemic Logic.

Author Information

Hans van Ditmarsch, LORIA, CNRS – University of Lorraine, France
Wiebe van der Hoek, The University of Liverpool, United Kingdom
Barteld Kooi, University of Groningen, Netherlands


Scientific Change

How do scientific theories, concepts and methods change over time? Answers to this question have historical parts and philosophical parts. There can be descriptive accounts of the recorded differences over time of particular theories, concepts, and methods—what might be called the shape of scientific change. Many stories of scientific change attempt to give more than statements of what, where and when change took place. Why this change then, and toward what end? By what processes did they take place? What is the nature of scientific change?

This article gives a brief overview of the most influential views on the shape and nature of change in science. Important thematic questions are: How gradual or rapid is scientific change? Is science really revolutionary? How radical is the change? Are periods in science incommensurable, or is there continuity between the first and latest scientific ideas? Is science getting closer to some final form, or merely moving away from a contingent, non-determining past? What role do the factors of community, society, gender, or technology play in facilitating or mitigating scientific change? The most important modern development in the topic is that none of these questions have the same answer for all sciences. When we speak of scientific change it should be recognized that it is only at a fairly contextualized level of description of the practices of scientists at rather specific times and places that anything substantial can be said.

Nonetheless, scientific change is connected with many other key issues in philosophy of science and broader epistemology, such as realism, rationality and relativism. The present article does not attempt to address them all. Higher-order debates regarding the methods of historiography or the epistemology of science, or the disciplinary differences between History and Philosophy, while important and interesting, represent an iteration of reflection on top of scientific change itself, and so go beyond the article’s scope.

Table of Contents

  1. If Science Changes, What is Science?
  2. History of Science and Scientific Change
  3. Philosophical Views on Change and Progress in Science
    1. Kuhn, Paradigms and Revolutions
      1. Key Concepts in Kuhn’s Account of Scientific Change
      2. Incommensurability as the Result of Radical Scientific Change
    2. Lakatos and Progressing and Degenerating Research Programs
    3. Laudan and Research Traditions
  4. The Social Processes of Change
    1. Fleck
    2. Hull’s Evolutionary Account of Scientific Change
  5. Cognitive Views on Scientific Change
    1. Cognitive History of Science
    2. Scientific Change and Science Education
  6. Further Reading and References
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Concepts, Cognition and Change
      2. Feminist, Situated and Social Approaches
      3. The Scientific Revolution

1. If Science Changes, What is Science?

We begin with some organizing remarks. It is interesting to note at the outset the reflexive nature of the topic of scientific change. A main concern of science is understanding physical change, whether it be motions, growth, cause and effect, the creation of the universe or the evolution of species. Scientific views of change have influenced philosophical views of change and of identity, particularly among philosophers impressed by science's success at predicting and controlling change. These philosophical views are then reflected back, through the history and philosophy of science, as images of how science itself changes, of how its theories are created, evolve and die. Models of change from science—evolutionary, mechanical, revolutionary—often serve as models of change in science.

This makes it difficult to disentangle the actual history of science from our philosophical expectations about it. And the historiography and the philosophy of science do not always live together comfortably. Historians balk at the evaluative, forward-looking, and often necessitarian, claims of standard philosophical reconstructions of scientific events. Philosophers, for their part, have argued that details of the history of science matter little to a proper theory of scientific change, and that a distinction can and should be made between how scientific ideas are discovered and how they are justified. Beneath the ranging, messy, and contingent happenings which led to our current scientific outlook, there lies a progressive, systematically evolving activity waiting to be rationally reconstructed.

Clearly, to tell any story of ‘science changing’ means looking beneath the surface of those changes in order to find something that remains constant, the thing which remains science. Conversely, what one takes to be the demarcating criteria of science will largely dictate how one talks about its changes. What part of human history is to be identified with science? Where does science start and where does it end? The breadth of science has a dimension across concurrent events as well as across the past and future. That is, it has both synchronic (at a time) and diachronic (over time) dimensions. Science will consist of a range of contemporary events which need to be demarcated. But likewise, science has a temporal breadth: a beginning, or possibly several beginnings, and possibly several ends.

The synchronic dimension of science is one way views of scientific change can be distinguished. On one hand there are logical or rationalistic views according to which scientific activity can be reduced to a collection of objective, rational decisions of a number of individual scientists. On this latter view, the most significant changes in science can each be described through the logically-reconstructable actions and words of one historical figure, or at most a very few. According to many of the more recent views, however, an adequate picture of science cannot be formed with anything less than the full context of social and political structures: the personal, institutional, and cultural relations scientists are a part of. We look at some of these broader sociological views in the section on social process of change.

Historians and philosophers of science have wanted also to “broaden” science diachronically, to historicize its content, such that the justifications of science, or even its meanings, cannot be divorced from their past. We will begin with the most influential figure for history and philosophy of science in North America in the last half-century: Thomas Kuhn. Kuhn's work in the middle of the last century was primarily a reaction to the then prevalent, rationalistic and a-historical view described in the previous paragraph. Along with Kuhn, we describe the closely related views of Imre Lakatos and Larry Laudan. For an introduction to the most influential philosophical accounts of the diachronical development of science, see Losee 2004.

When Kuhn and the others advanced their new views on the development of science into Anglo-Saxon philosophy of science, history and sociology were already an important part of the landscape of Continental history and philosophy of science. A discussion of these views can be found as part of the sociology of science section as well. The article concludes with more recent naturalized approaches to scientific change, which turn to cognitive science for accounts of scientific understanding and how that understanding is formed and changed, as well as suggestions for further reading.

Science itself, at least in a form recognizable to us, is a twentieth century phenomenon. Although a matter of debate, the canonical view of the history of scientific change is that its seminal event is the one tellingly labeled the Scientific Revolution. It is usually dated to the 16th and 17th centuries. The first historiographies of science—as much construction of the revolution as they were documentation—were not far behind, coming in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. Professionalization of the history of science, characterized by reflections on the telling of the history of science, followed later. We begin our story there.

2. History of Science and Scientific Change

As history of science professionalized, becoming a separate academic discipline in the twentieth century, scientific change was seen early on as an important theme within the discipline. Admittedly, the idea of radical change was not a key notion for early practitioners of the field such as George Sarton (1884-1956), the father of history of science in the United States, but with the work of historians of science such as Alexandre Koyré (1892-1964), Herbert Butterfield (1900-1979) and A. Rupert Hall (1920-2009), radical conceptual transformations came to play a much more important role.

One of the early outcomes of this interest in change was the volume Scientific Change (Crombie, 1963) in which historians of science covering the span of science from the physical to the biological sciences, and the span of history from antiquity to modern science, all investigated the conditions for scientific change by examining cases from a multitude of periods, societies, and scientific disciplines. The introduction to Crombie's volume presented a large number of questions regarding scientific change that remained key issues in both history and philosophy of science for several decades:

What were the essential changes in scientific thought and how were they brought about? What was the part played in the initiation of change by mutations in fundamental ideas leading to new questions being asked, new problems being seen, new criteria of satisfactory explanation replacing the old? What was the part played by new technical inventions in mathematics and experimental apparatus; by developments in pure mathematics; by the refinements of measurement; by the transference of ideas, methods and information from one field of study to another? What significance can be given to the description and use of scientific methods and concepts in advance of scientific achievement? How have methods and concepts of explanation differed in different sciences? How has language changed in changing scientific contexts? What parts have chance and personal idiosyncrasy played in discovery? How have scientific changes been located in the context of general ideas and intellectual motives, and to what extent have extra-scientific beliefs given theories their power to convince? … How have scientific and technical changes been located in the social context of motives and opportunities? What value has been put on scientific activity by society at large, by the needs of industry, commerce, war, medicine and the arts, by governmental and private investment, by religion, by different states and social systems? To what external social, economic and political pressures have science, technology and medicine been exposed? Are money and opportunity all that is needed to create scientific and technical progress in modern society? (Crombie, 1963, p. 10)

Of particular interest among historians of science have been the changes associated with scientific revolutions and especially the period often referred to as the Scientific Revolution, seen as the sum of achievements in science from Copernicus to Newton (Cohen 1985; Hall 1954; Koyré 1965). The word ‘revolution’ had started being applied in the eighteenth century to the developments in astronomy and physics as well as the change in chemical theory which emerged with the work of Lavoisier in the 1770s, or the change in biology which was initiated by Darwin’s work in the mid-nineteenth century. These were fundamental changes that overturned not only the reigning theories but also carried with them significant consequences outside their respective scientific disciplines. In most of the early work in history of science, scientific change in the form of scientific revolutions was something which happened only rarely. This view was changed by the historian and philosopher of science Thomas S. Kuhn whose 1962 monograph The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1970) came to influence philosophy of science for decades. Kuhn wanted in his monograph to argue for a change in the philosophical conceptions of science and its development, but based on historical case studies. The notion of revolutions that he used in Structure included not only fundamental changes of theory that had a significant influence on the overall world view of both scientists and non-scientists, but also changes of theory whose consequences remained solely within the scientific discipline in which the change had taken place. This considerably widened the notion of scientific revolutions compared to earlier historians and initiated discussions among both historians and philosophers on the balance between continuity and change in the development of science.

3. Philosophical Views on Change and Progress in Science

In the British and North American schools of philosophy of science, scientific change did not became a major topic until the 1960s onwards when historically inclined philosophers of science, including Thomas S. Kuhn (1922-1996), Paul K. Feyerabend (1924-1994), N. Russell Hanson (1924-1967), Michael Polanyi (1891-1971), Stephen Toulmin (1922-2009) and Mary Hesse (*1924) started questioning the assumptions of logical positivism, arguing that philosophy of science should be concerned with the historical structure of science rather than with an ahistorical logical structure which they found to be a chimera. The occupation with history led naturally to a focus on how science develops, including whether science progresses incrementally or through changes which represent some kind of discontinuity.

Similar questions had also been discussed among Continental scholars. The development of the theory of relativity and of quantum mechanics in the beginning of the twentieth century suggested that empirical science could overturn deeply held intuitions and introduce counter-intuitive new concepts and ideas; and several European philosophers, among them the German neo-Kantian philosopher Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945), directed their work towards rejecting Kant’s absolute categories in favor of categories that may change over time. In France, the historian and philosopher of science Gaston Bachelard (1884-1962) also noted that what Kant had taken to be absolute preconditions for knowledge had turned out wrong in the light of modern physics. On Bachelard’s view, what had seemed to be absolute preconditions for knowledge were instead merely contingent conditions. These conditions were still required for scientific reasoning and therefore, Bachelard concluded, a full account of scientific reasoning could only be derived from reflections upon its historical conditions and development. Based on the analysis of the historical development of science, Bachelard advanced a model of scientific change according to which the conceptions of nature are from time to time replaced by radical new conceptions – what Bachelard called epistemological breaks.

Bachelard’s view was later developed and modified by the historian and philosopher of science, and student of Bachelard, George Canguilhem (1904-1995) and by the philosopher and social historian, and student of Canguilhem, Michel Foucault (1926-1984). Beyond the teacher-student connections, there are other commonalities which unify this tradition. In North America and England, among those who wanted to make philosophy more like science, or to import into philosophical practice lessons from the success of science, the exemplar was almost always physics. The most striking and profound advances in science seemed to be, after all, in physics, namely the quantum and relativity revolutions. But on the Continent, model sciences were just as often linguistics or sociology, biology or anthropology, and not limited to those. Canguilhem's interest in changing notions of the normal versus the pathological, for example, coming from an interest in medicine, typified the more human-centered theorising of the tradition. What we as humans know, how we know it, and how we successfully achieve our aims, are the guiding questions, not how to escape our human condition or situatedness.

Foucault described his project as archaeology of the history of human thought and its conditions. He compared his project to Kant’s critique of reason, but with the difference that Foucault’s interest was in a historical a priori; that is, with what seem to be for a given period the necessary conditions governing reason, and how these constraints have a contingent historical origin. Hence, in his analysis of the development of the human sciences from the Renaissance to the present, Foucault described various so-called epistemes that determined the conditions for all knowledge of their time, and he argued that the transition from one episteme to the next happens as a break that entails radical changes in the conception of knowledge. Michael Friedman's work on the relativized and dynamic a priori can be seen as continuation of this thread (Friedman 2001). For a detailed account of the work of Bachelard, Canguilhem and Foucalt, see Gutting (1989).

With the advent of Kuhn’s Structure, “non-Continental” philosophy of science also started focusing in its own way on the historical development of science, often apparently unaware of the earlier tradition, and in the decades to follow alternative models were developed to describe how theories supersede their successors, and whether progress in science is gradual and incremental or whether it is discontinuous. Among the key contributions to this discussion, besides Kuhn’s famous paradigm-shift model, were Imre Lakatos’ (1922-1974) model of progressing and degenerating research programs and Larry Laudan’s (*1941) model of successive research traditions.

a. Kuhn, Paradigms and Revolutions

One of the key contributions that provoked interest in scientific change among philosophers of science was Thomas S. Kuhn’s seminal monograph The Structure of Scientific Revolutions from 1962. The aim of this monograph was to question the view that science is cumulative and progressive, and Kuhn opened with: “History, if viewed as a repository for more than anecdote or chronology, could produce a decisive transformation in the image of science by which we are now possessed” (p. 1). History was expected to do more than just chronicle the successive increments of, or impediments to, our progress towards the present. Instead, historians and philosophers should focus on the historical integrity of science at a particular time in its development, and should analyze science as it developed. Instead of describing a cumulative, teleological development toward the present, history of science should see science as developing from a given point in history. Kuhn expected a new image of science would emerge from this diachronic historiography. In the rest of Structure he used historical examples to question the view of science as a cumulative development in which scientists gradually add new pieces to the ever-growing aggregate of scientific knowledge, and instead he described how science develops through successive periods of tradition-preserving normal science and tradition-shattering revolutions. For introductions to Kuhn’s philosophy of science, see for example Andersen 2001, Bird 2000, and Hoyningen-Huene 1993.

i. Key Concepts in Kuhn’s Account of Scientific Change

On Kuhn’s model, science proceeds in key phases. The predominant phase is normal science which, while progressing successfully in its aims, inherently generates what Kuhn calls anomalies. In brief, anomalies lead to crisis and extraordinary science, followed by revolution, and finally a new phase of normal science.

Normal science is characterized by a consensus which exists throughout the scientific community as to (a) the concepts used in communication among scientists, (b) the problems which can meaningfully be formulated as relevant research problems, and (c) a set of exemplary problem solutions that serve as models in solving new problems. Kuhn first introduced the notion 'paradigm' to denote these shared communal aspects, and also the tools used by that community for solving its research problems. Because so much was apparently captured by the term ‘paradigm’, Kuhn was criticized for using the term in ambiguous ways (see especially Masterman 1970). He later offered the alternative notion 'disciplinary matrix', covering (a) symbolic generalizations, or laws in their most fundamental forms, (b) beliefs about which objects and phenomena that exist in the world, (c) values by which the quality of research can be evaluated, and (d) exemplary problems and problem situations. In normal science, scientists draw on the tools provided by the disciplinary matrix, and they expect the solutions of new problems to be in consonance with the descriptions and solutions of the problems that they have previously examined. But sometimes these expectations are violated. Problems may turn out not to be solvable in an acceptable way, and then instead they represent anomalies for the reigning theories.

Not all anomalies are equally severe. Some discrepancy can always be found between theoretical predictions and experimental findings, and this does not necessarily challenge the foundations of normal science. Hence, some anomalies can be neglected, at least for some time. Others may find a solution within the reigning theoretical framework. Only a small number will be so severe and so persistent, that they suggest the tools provided by the accepted theories must be given up, or at least be seriously modified. Science has then entered the crisis phase of Kuhn's model. Even in crisis, revolution may not be immediately forthcoming. Scientists may “agree” that no solution is likely to be found in the present state of their field and simply set the problems aside for future scientists to solve with more developed tools, while they return to normal science in its present form. More often though, when crisis has become severe enough for questioning the foundation, and the anomalies may be solved by a new theory, that theory gradually receives acceptance until eventually a new consensus is established among members of the scientific community regarding the new theory. Only in this case has a scientific revolution occurred.

Importantly though, even severe anomalies are not simply falsifying instances. Severe anomalies cause scientists to question the accepted theories, but the anomalies do not lead the scientists to abandon the paradigm without an alternative to replace it. This raises a crucial question regarding scientific change on Kuhn's model: where do new theories come from? Kuhn said little about this creative aspect of scientific change; a topic that later became central to cognitively inclined philosophers of science working on scientific change (see the section on Cognitive Views below). Kuhn described merely how severe anomalies would become the fixation point for further research, while attempts to solve them might gradually diverge more and more from the solution hitherto accepted as exemplary. Until, in the course of this development, embryonic forms of alternative theories were born.

ii. Incommensurability as the Result of Radical Scientific Change

For Kuhn the relation between normal science traditions separated by a scientific revolution cannot be described as incorporation of one into the other, or as incremental growth. To describe the relation, Kuhn adopted the term ‘incommensurability’ from mathematics, claiming that the new normal-scientific tradition which emerges from a scientific revolution is not only incompatible but often actually incommensurable with that which has gone before.

Kuhn's notion of incommensurability covered three different aspects of the relation between the pre- and post-revolutionary normal science traditions: (1) a change in the set of scientific problems and the way in which they are attacked, (2) conceptual changes, and (3) a change, in some sense, in the world of the scientists’ research. This latter, “world-changing” aspect is the most fundamental aspect of incommensurability. However, it is a matter of great debate exactly how strongly we should take Kuhn's meaning, for instance when he stated that “though the world does not change with a change of paradigm, the scientist afterwards works in a different world” (p. 121). To make sense of these claims it is necessary to distinguish between two different senses of the term ‘world’: the world as the independent object which scientists investigate and the world as the perceived world in which scientists practice their trade.

In Structure, Kuhn argued for incommensurability in perceptual terms. Drawing on results from psychological experiments showing that subjects’ perceptions of various objects were dependent on their training and experience, Kuhn suspected that something like a paradigm was prerequisite to perception itself and that, therefore, different normal science traditions would cause scientists to perceive differently. But when it comes to visual gestalt-switch images, one has recourse to the actual lines drawn on the paper. Contrary to this possibility of employing an ‘external standard’, Kuhn claimed that scientists can have no recourse above or beyond what they see with their eyes and instruments. For Kuhn, the change in perception cannot be reduced to a change in the interpretation of stable data, simply because stable data do not exist. Kuhn thus strongly attacked the idea of a neutral observation-language; an attack similarly launched by other scholars during the late 1950s and early 1960s, most notably Hanson (Hanson 1958).

These aspects of incommensurability have important consequences for the communication between proponents of competing normal science traditions and for the choice between such traditions. Recognizing different problems and adopting different standards and concepts, scientists may talk past each other when debating the relative merits of their respective paradigms. But if they do not agree on the list of problems that must be solved or on what constitutes an acceptable solution, there can be no point-by-point comparison of competing theories. Instead, Kuhn claimed that the role of paradigms in theory choice was necessarily circular in the sense that the proponents of each would use their own paradigm to argue in that paradigm’s defense. Paradigm choice is a conversion that cannot be forced by logic and neutral experience.

This view has led many critics of Kuhn to the misunderstanding that he saw paradigm choice as devoid of rational elements. However, Kuhn did emphasize that although paradigm choice cannot be justified by proof, this does not mean that arguments are not relevant or that scientists are not rationally persuaded to change their minds. In contrast, Kuhn argued that, “Individual scientists embrace a new paradigm for all sorts of reasons and usually for several at once.” (Kuhn 1996. p. 152)  According to Kuhn, such arguments are, first of all, about whether the new paradigm can solve the problems that have led the old paradigm to a crisis, whether it displays a quantitative precision strikingly better than its older competitor, and whether in the new paradigm or with the new theory there are predictions of phenomena that had been entirely unsuspected while the old one prevailed. Aesthetic arguments, based on simplicity for example, may enter as well.

Another common misunderstanding of Kuhn’s notion of incommensurability is that it should be taken to imply a total discontinuity between the normal science traditions separated by a scientific revolution. Kuhn emphasized, rather, that a new paradigm often incorporates much of the vocabulary and apparatus, both conceptual and manipulative, of its predecessor. Paradigm shifts may be “non-cumulative developmental episodes …,” but the former paradigm can be replaced “... in whole or in part …” (Ibid. p. 2). In this way, parts of the achievements of a normal science tradition will turn out to be permanent, even across a revolution. “[P]ostrevolutionary science invariably includes many of the same manipulations, performed with the same instruments and described in the same terms ...” (Ibid. p 129-130). Incommensurability is a relation that holds only between minor parts of the object domains of two competing theories.

b. Lakatos and Progressing and Degenerating Research Programs

Lakatos agreed with Kuhn’s insistence on the tenacity of some scientific theories and the rejection of naïve falsification, but he was opposed to Kuhn’s account of the process of change, which he saw as “a matter for mob psychology” (Lakatos, 1970, p. 178). Lakatos therefore sought to improve upon Kuhn’s account by providing a more satisfactory methodology of scientific change, along with a meta-methodological justification of the rationality of that method, both of which were seen to be either lacking or significantly undeveloped in Kuhn’s early writings. On Lakatos’ account, a scientific research program consists of a central core that is taken to be inviolable by scientists working within the research program, and a collection of auxiliary hypotheses that are continuously developing as the core is applied. In this way, the methodological rules of a research program divide into two different kinds: a negative heuristic that tells the scientists which paths of research to avoid, and a positive heuristic that tells the scientists which paths to pursue. On this view, all tests are necessarily directed at the auxiliary hypotheses which come to form a protective belt around the hard core of the research program.

Lakatos aims to reconstruct changes in science as occurring within research programs. A research program is constituted by the series of theories resulting from adjustments to the protective belt but all of which share a hard core. As adjustments are made in response to problems, new problems arise, and over a series of theories there will be a collective problem-shift. Any series of theories is theoretically progressive, or constitutes a theoretically progressive problem-shift, if and only if there is at least one theory in the series which has some excess empirical content over its predecessor. In the case if this excess empirical content is also corroborated the series of theories is empirically progressive. A problem-shift is progressive, then, if it is both theoretically and empirically progressive, otherwise it is degenerate. A research program is successful if it leads to progressive problem-shifts and unsuccessful if it leads to degenerating problem-shifts. The further aim of Lakatos’ account, in other words, is to discover, through reconstruction in terms of research programs, where progress is made in scientific change.

The rationally reconstructive aspect of Lakatos’ account is the target of criticism. The notion of empirical content, for instance, is carrying a pretty heavy burden in the account. In order to assess the progressiveness of a program, one would seem to need a measure of the empirical content of theories in order to judge when there is excess content. Without some such measure, however, Lakatos' methodology is dangerously close to being vacuous or ad hoc.

We can instead take the increase in empirical content to be a meta-methodological principle, one which dictates an aim for scientists (that is, to increase empirical knowledge), while cashing this out at the methodological level by identifying progress in research programs with making novel predictions. The importance of novel predictions, in other words, can be justified by their leading to an increase in the empirical content of the theories of a research program. A problem-shift which results in novel predictions can be taken to entail an increase in empirical content. It remains a worry, however, whether such an inference is warranted, since it seems to simply assume novelty and cumulativity go together unproblematically. That they might not was precisely Kuhn's point.

A second objection is that Lakatos' reconstruction of scientific change through appeal to a unified method runs counter to the prevailing attitude among philosophers of science from the second half of the twentieth century on, according to which there is no unified method for all of science. At best, anything they all have in common methodologically will be so general as to be unhelpful or uninteresting.

At any rate, Lakatos does offer us a positive heuristic for the description and even explanation of scientific change. For him, change in science is a difficult and delicate thing, requiring balance and persistence. “Purely negative, destructive criticism, like ‘refutation’ or demonstration of an inconsistency does not eliminate a program. Criticism of a program is a long and often frustrating process and one must treat budding programs leniently. One may, of course, whop up on [criticize] the degeneration of a research program, but it is only constructive criticism which, with the help of rival research programs, can achieve real successes; and dramatic spectacular results become visible only with hindsight and rational reconstruction” (Lakatos, 1970, p. 179).

c. Laudan and Research Traditions

In his Progress and Its Problems: Towards a Theory of Scientific Growth (1977), Laudan defined a research tradition as a set of general assumptions about the entities and processes in a given domain and about the appropriate methods to be used for investigating the problems and constructing the theories in that domain. Such research traditions should be seen as historical entities created and articulated within a particular intellectual environment, and as historical entities they would “wax and wane” (p. 95). On Laudan’s view, it is important to consider scientific change both as changes that may appear within a research tradition and as changes of the research tradition itself.

The key engine driving scientific change for Laudan is problem solving. Changes within a research tradition may be minor modifications of subordinate, specific theories, such as modifications of boundary conditions, revisions of constants, refinements of terminology, or expansion of a theory’s classificatory network to encompass new discoveries. Such changes solve empirical problems, essentially those problems Kuhn conceives of as anomalies. But, contrary to Kuhn's normal science and to Lakatos' research programs, Laudan held that changes within a research tradition might also involve changes to its most basic core elements. Severe anomalies which are not solvable merely by modification of specific theories within the tradition may be seen as symptoms of a deeper conceptual problem. In such cases scientists may instead explore what sorts of (minimal) adjustments could be made in the deep-level methodology or ontology of that research tradition (p. 98). When Laudan looked at the history of science, he saw Aristotelians who had abandoned the Aristotelian doctrine that motion in a void is impossible, and Newtonians who had abandoned the Newtonian demand that all matter has inertial mass, and he saw no reason to claim that they were no longer working within those research traditions.

Solutions to conceptual problems may even result in a theory with less empirical support and still count as progress since it is overall problem solving effectiveness (not all problems are empirical ones) which is the measure of success of a research tradition (Laudan 1996). Most importantly for Laudan, if there are what can be called revolutions in science, they reflect different kinds of problems, not a different sort of activity. David Pearce calls this Laudan's methodological monism (see Pearce 1984). For Kuhn and Lakatos, identification of a research tradition (or program or paradigm) could be made at the level of specific invariant, non-rejectable elements. For Laudan, there is no such class of sacrosanct elements within a research tradition—everything is open to change over time. For example, while absolute time and space were seen as part of the unrejectable core of Newtonian physics in the eighteenth century, they were no longer seen as such a century later. This leaves a dilemma for Laudan’s view. If research traditions undergo deep-level transformations of their problem solving apparatus this would seem to constitute a significant change to the problem solving activity that may warrant considering the change the basis of a new research tradition. On the other hand, if the activity of problem solving is strong enough to provide the identity conditions of a tradition across changes, consistency might force us to identify all problem solving activity as part of one research tradition, blurring distinctions between science and non-science. Distinguishing between a change within a research tradition and the replacement of a research tradition with another seems both arbitrary and open-ended. One way of solving this problem is by turning from just internal characteristics of science to external factors of social and historical context.

4. The Social Processes of Change

Science is not just a body of facts or sets of sentences. However one characterizes its content, that content must be embodied in institutions and practices comprised of scientists themselves. An important question then, with respect to scientific change, regards how “science” is constructed out of scientists, and which unit of analysis – the individual scientist or the community—is the proper one for understanding the dynamic of scientific change? Popper's falsificationism was very much a matter of personal responsibility and reflection. Kuhn, on the other hand, saw scientific change as a change of community and generations. While Structure may have been largely responsible for making North American philosophers aware of the importance of historical and social context in shaping scientific change, Kuhn was certainly not the first to theorize about it. Kuhn himself recognized his views in the earlier work of Ludwick Fleck (See for example Brorson and Andersen 2001, Babich 2007 and Mössner 2011 for comparisons between the views of Kuhn and Fleck).

a. Fleck

As early as the mid-1930s, Ludwik Fleck (1896-1961) gave an account of how thoughts and ideas change through their circulation within the social strata of a thought-collective (Denkkollektiv) and how this thought-traffic contributes to the process of verification. Drawing on a case study from medicine on the development of a diagnostic test for syphilis, Ludwik Fleck argued in his 1935 monograph Genesis and the Development of a Scientific Fact that a thought collective is a functional unit in which people who interact intellectually are tied together through a particular ‘thought style’ that forces narrow constraints upon the thinking of the individual. The thought-style is dogmatically transmitted from one generation to the next, by initiation, training, education or other devices whose aim is introduction into the collective. Most people participate in numerous thought-collectives, and any individual therefore possesses several overlapping thought-styles and may become carriers of influence between the various thought-collectives in which they participate. This traffic of thoughts outside the collective is linked to the most outstanding alterations in thought-content. The ensuing modification and assimilation according to the foreign thought-style is a significant source of divergent thinking. According to Fleck, any circulation of thoughts therefore also causes transformation of the circulated thought.

In Kuhn’s Structure, the distinction between the individual scientist and the community as the agent of change was not quite clear, and Kuhn later regretted having used the notion of a gestalt switch to characterize changes in a community because “communities do not have experiences, much less gestalt switches.” Consequently, he realized that “to speak, as I repeatedly have, of a community’s undergoing a gestalt switch is to compress an extended process of change into an instant, leaving no room for the microprocesses by which the change is achieved” (Kuhn 1989, p. 50). Rather than helping himself to an unexamined notion of communal change, Fleck, on the other hand, made the process by which individual interacted with collective central to his account of scientific development and the joint construction of scientific thought. What the accounts have in common is a view that the social plays a role in scientific change through the social shaping of science content. It is not a relation between scientist and physical world which is constitutive of scientific knowledge, but a relation between the scientists and the discipline to which they belong. That relation can be restrictive of change in science. It can also provide the dynamics for change.

b. Hull’s Evolutionary Account of Scientific Change

Several philosophers of science have held the view that the dynamics of scientific change can be seen as an evolutionary process in which some kind of selection plays a central role. One of the most detailed evolutionary accounts of scientific change has been provided by David Hull (1935-2010). On Hull's account of scientific change, the development of science is a function of the interplay between cooperation and competition for credit among scientists. Hence, selection in the form of citations plays a central role in this account.

The basic structure of Hull’s account is that, for the content element of science—problems and their solutions, accumulated data, but also beliefs about the goals of science, proper ways to realize these goals, and so forth—to survive in science they must be transmitted more or less intact through history. That is, they must be seen as replicators that pass on their structure in successive replication. Hence, conceptual replication is a matter of information being transmitted largely intact by different vehicles. These vehicles of transmission may be media such as books or journals, but also scientists themselves. Whereas books and journals are passive vehicles, scientists are active in testing and changing the transmitted ideas. They are therefore not only vehicles of transmission but also interactors, interacting with their environment in a way that causes replication to be differential and hence enabling of scientific change.

Hull did not elaborate much on the inner structure of differential replication, apart from arguing that the underdetermination of theory by observation made it possible. Instead, the focus of his account is on the selection mechanism that can cause some lineages of scientific ideas to cease and others to continue. First, scientists tend to behave in ways that increase their conceptual fitness. Scientists want their work to be accepted, which requires that they gain support from other scientists. One kind of support is to show that their work rests on preceding research. But that is at the same time a decrease in originality. There is a trade-off between credit and support. Scientists whose support is worth having are likely to be cited more frequently.

Second, this social process is highly structured. Scientists tend to organize into tightly knit research groups in order to develop and disseminate a particular set of views. Few scientists have all the skills and knowledge necessary to solve the problems that they confront; they therefore tend to form research groups of varying degrees of cohesiveness. Cooperating scientists may often share ideas that are identical in descent, and transmission of their contributions can be viewed as similar to kin selection. In the wider scientific community, scientists may form a deme in the sense that they use the ideas of each other much more frequently than the ideas of scientists outside the community.

Initially, criticism and evaluation come from within a research group. Scientists expose their work to severe tests prior to publication, but some things are taken so much for granted that it never occurs to them to question it. After publication, it shifts to scientists outside the group, especially opponents who are likely to have different—though equally unnoticed—presuppositions. The self-correction of science depends on other scientists having different perspectives and different career interests—scientists’ career interests are not damaged by refuting the views of their opponents.

5. Cognitive Views on Scientific Change

Scientific change received new interest during the 1980s and 1990s with the emergence of cognitive science; a field that draws on cognitive psychology, cognitive anthropology, linguistics, philosophy, artificial intelligence and neuroscience. Historians and philosophers of science adapted results from this interdisciplinary work to develop new approaches to their field. Among the approaches are Paul Churchland’s (*1942) neurocomputational perspective (Churchland, 1989; Churchland, 1992), Ronald Giere’s (*1938) work on cognitive models of science (Giere, 1988), Nancy Nersessian’s (*1947) cognitive history of science (Nersessian, 1984; Nersessian, 1992; Nersessian, 1995a; 1995b), and Paul Thagard’s (*1950) computational philosophy of science (Thagard, 1988; Thagard, 1992). Rather than explaining scientific change in terms of a priori principles, these new approaches aim at being naturalized by drawing on cognitive science to provide insights on how humans generally construct and develop conceptual systems and how they use these insights in analyses of scientific change as conceptual change. (For an overview of research in conceptual change, see (Vosniadou, 2008).)

a. Cognitive History of Science

Much of the early work on conceptual change emphasized the discontinuous character of major changes by using metaphors like ‘gestalt switch’, indicating that such major changes happen all at once. This idea had originally been introduced by Kuhn, but in his later writings he admitted that his use of the gestalt switch metaphor had its origin in his experience as a historian working backwards in time and that, consequently, it was not necessarily suitable for describing the experience of the scientists taking part in scientific development. Instead of dramatic gestalt shifts, it is equally plausible that for the historical actors there exist micro-processes in their conceptual development. The development of science may happen stepwise with minor changes and yet still sum up over time to something that appears revolutionary to the historian looking backward and comparing the original conceptual structures to the end product of subsequent changes. Kuhn realized this, but also saw that his own work did not offer any details on how such micro-processes would work, though it did leave room for their exploration (Kuhn 1989).

Exploration of conceptual microstructures has been one of the main issues within the cognitive history and philosophy of science. Historical case studies of conceptual change have been carried out by many scholars, including Nersessian, Thagard, the Andersen-Barker-Chen groupThat (see for example Nersessian, 1984; Thagard, 1992; Andersen, Barker, and Chen, 2006).

Some of the early work in cognitive history and philosophy of science focused on mapping conceptual structures at different stages during scientific change (see for example Thagard, 1990; Thagard and Nowak, 1990; Nersessian and Resnick, 1989) and developing typologies of conceptual change in terms of their degree of severeness (Thagard, 1992). These approaches are useful for comparing between different stages of scientific change and for discussing such issues as incommensurability. However, they do not provide much detail on the creative process through which changes are created.

Other lines of research have focused on the reasoning processes that are used in creating new concepts during scientific change. One of the early contributions to this line of work was Shapere who argued that, as concepts evolve, chains of reasoning connect the successive versions of a concept. These chains of reasoning therefore also establish continuity in scientific change, and this continuity can only be fully understood by analysis of the reasons that motivated each step in the chain of changes (Shapere 1987a;1987b). Over the last two decades, this approach has been extended and substantiated by Nersessian (2008a; 2008b) whose work has focused on the nature of the practices employed by scientists in creating, communicating and replacing scientific representations within a given scientific domain. She argues that conceptual change is a problem-solving process. Model-based reasoning processes, especially, are used to facilitate and constrain abstraction and information from multiple sources during this process.

b. Scientific Change and Science Education

Aiming at insights into general mechanisms of conceptual development, some of the cognitive approaches have been directed toward investigating not only the development of science, but also how sciences are learned. During the 1980s and early 1990s, several scholars argued that conceptual divides of the same kind as described by Kuhn’s incommensurability thesis might exist in science education between teacher and student. Science teaching should, therefore, address these misconceptions in an attempt to facilitate conceptual change in students. Part of this research incorporated the (controversial) thesis that the development of ideas in students mirrors the development of ideas in the history of science—that cognitive ontogeny recapitulates scientific phylogeny. For the field of mechanics in particular, research was done to show that children’s’ naïve beliefs parallel early scientific beliefs, like impetus theories, for example. (Champagne, Klopfer, and Anderson, 1980; Clement, 1983; McClosky, 1983). However, most research went beyond the search for analogies between students’ naïve views and historically held beliefs. Instead, they carried out material investigations of the cognitive processes employed by scientists in constructing scientific concepts and theories more generally, through the available historical records, focussing on the kinds of reasoning strategies communicated in those records (see Nersessian, 1992; Nersessian, 1995a). Thus, this work still assumed that the cognitive activities of scientists in their construction of new scientific concepts was relevant to learning, but it marked a return to a view of the relevance of the history of science as a repository of case studies demonstrating how scientific concepts are constructed and changed. In assuming a conceptual continuity between scientific understanding “then and now,” the cognitive approach had moved away from the Kuhnian emphasis on incommensurability and gestalt shift conceptual change.

6. Further Reading and References

It is impossible to disentangle entirely the history and philosophy of scientific change from a great number of other issues and disciplines. We have not addressed here the epistemology of science, the role of experiments in science (or of thought experiments), for instance. The question of whether science, or knowledge in general, is approaching truth, or tracking truth, or approximating to truth, are debates taken up in epistemology. For more on those issues one should consult the relevant references. Whether science progresses (and not just changes) is a question which supports its own literature as well. Many iterations of interpretations, criticism and replies to challenges of incommensurability, non-cumulativity, and irrationality of science have been given. Beliefs in scientific progress founded on a naïve realism, according to which science is getting ever closer to a literally true picture of the world, have been criticized soundly. A simple version of the criticism is the pessimistic meta-induction: every scientific image of reality in the past has been proven wrong, therefore all future scientific images will be wrong (see Putnam 1978; Laudan 1984). In response to challenges to realism, much attention has been paid to structural realism, an attempt to describe some underlying mathematical structure which is preserved even across major theory changes. Past theories were not entirely wrong, on this view, and not entirely discarded, because they had some of the structure correct, albeit wrongly interpreted or embedded in a mistaken ontology or broader world view which has been since abandoned.
On the question of unity of science, on whether the methods of science are universal or plural, and whether they are rational, see the references given for Cartwright (2007), Feyerabend (1974), Mitchell (2000;2003); Kellert, et al (2006). For feminist criticisms and alternatives to traditional philosophy and history of science the interested reader should consult Longino (1990;2002); Gary, et al (1996); Keller, et al (1996); Ruetsche (2004). Clough (2004) puts forward a program combining feminism and naturalism. Among twenty-first century approaches to the historicity of science there are Friedman's dynamic a priori approach (Friedman 2001), the evolving subject-object relation of McGuire and Tuchanska (2000), and complementary science of Hasok Chang (2004).

Finally, on the topic of the Scientific Revolution, there are the standard Cohen (1985), Hall (1954) and Koyré (1965); but for subsequent discussion of the appropriateness of revolution as a metaphor in the historiography of science we recommend the collection Rethinking the Scientific Revolution, edited by Osler (2000).

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  • Thagard, P. (1992). Conceptual Revolutions. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Thagard, P. and Nowak, G. (1990). The Conceptual Structure of the Geological Revolution. In J. Shrager and P. Langley, eds. Computational Models of Scientific Discovery and Theory Formation. San Mateo: Morgan Kaufmann. 27-72.
  • Thagard, P. (1988). Computational Philosophy of Science. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Thagard, P. (1992). Conceptual Revolutions. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Vosniadou, S. (2008). International Handbook of Research in Conceptual Change. London: Routledge.

ii. Feminist, Situated and Social Approaches

  • Garry, Ann and Marilyn Pearsall, eds. (1996). Women, Knowledge and Reality: Explorations in Feminist Epistemology. New York: Routledge.
  • Goldman, Alvin. (1999). Knowledge in a Social World. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hacking, Ian. (1999). The Social Construction of What? Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Keller, Evelyn Fox and Helen Longino, eds. (1996). Feminism and Science. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Keller, Stephen H., and Helen E. Longino, and C. Kenneth Waters, eds (2006). Scientific Pluralism. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume 19, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Longino, H. E. (2002). The Fate of Knowledge. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Longino, H. E. (1990). Science as Social Knowledge: Values and Objectivity in Scientific Inquiry. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • McMullin, Ernan, ed. (1992). Social Dimensions of Scientific Knowledge. South Bend: Notre Dame University Press.
  • Ruetsche, Laura, 2004, “Virtue and Contingent History: Possibilities for Feminist Epistemology”, Hypatia, 19.1: 73–101
  • Solomon, Miriam. (2001). Social Empiricism. Cambridge: Massachusetts Institute of Technology Press.

iii. The Scientific Revolution

  • Cohen, I. B., (1985). Revolution in Science, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Koyré, A. (1965). Newtonian Studies. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Osler, Margaret (2000). Rethinking the Scientific Revolution. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.


Author Information

Hanne Andersen
University of Aarhus


Brian Hepburn
University of Aarhus

What Science Requires of Time

Table of Contents

  1. Relativity and Quantum Mechanics
  2. The Big Bang
  3. Infinite Time
  4. Continuity of Time

Relativity and Quantum Mechanics

EinsteinScience currently requires all the basic laws of science to be time symmetric, to not distinguish between change toward the future and change toward the past. [The second law of thermodynamics is not a basic law.] Also, the basic laws cannot change from one day to another. The basic laws are the laws at the foundation of our two most fundamental physical theories, general relativity and quantum mechanics. The Big Bang theory is the leading theory of cosmology, and it, too, has consequences for our understanding of time, as we shall see.

According to relativity and quantum mechanics, spacetime is, loosely speaking, a collection of points called “spacetime locations” where the universe’s physical events occur. Spacetime is four-dimensional and a continuum, and time is a distinguished, one-dimensional sub-space of this continuum. Therefore, it is less misleading to speak of 4-dimensional spacetime as (3 + 1)-dimensional spacetime.

Any interval of time–that is, any duration–is a linear continuum of instants. So, science requires every duration to have a point-like structure that is the same structure as an interval of real numbers. This implies that between any two instants there are an aleph-one infinity of other instants, and there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Notice that time is not quantized even in quantum mechanics.

That first response to the question “What does science require of time?” is too simple. There are complications. There is an important difference between the universe’s cosmic time and any object's proper time; and there is an important difference between proper time and a reference frame’s coordinate time.  Unlike in special relativity, most spacetimes can not have a single coordinate system. Also, special relativity considers space-time to be a passive arena for events, but general relativity requires spacetime to be dynamic in the sense that changes in matter-energy can change the curvature of space-time itself. All physicists believe that relativity and quantum mechanics are logically inconsistent and need to be replaced by a theory of quantum gravity. A successful theory of quantum gravity is likely to have radical implications for our understanding of time; two prominent suggestions of what those implications might be are that time and space will be seen to be discrete rather than continuous, and time and space will be seen to emerge from more basic entities. But today "the best game in town" says time is not discrete and does not emerge from a more basic timeless entity.

Aristotle, Newton, and everyone else before Einstein, believed there is a frame-independent notion of duration. For example, if the time interval (duration) between two lightning flashes is 100 seconds on someone’s accurate clock, then it also is 100 seconds on your own accurate clock, even if you are flying at an incredible speed nearby or far away. Einstein rejected this piece of common sense in his 1905 special theory of relativity when he declared that the duration of a non-instantaneous event is relative to (that is, depends on) the observer’s reference frame. As Einstein expressed it, “Every reference-body has its own particular time; unless we are told the reference-body to which the statement of time refers, there is no meaning in a statement of the time of an event.” Two reference frames, or reference-bodies, that are moving relative to each other will divide spacetime differently into its time part and its space part, so they will disagree about the duration of an event that is not instantaneous. In short, your accurate clock need not agree with my accurate clock, and any two initially synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they are in motion relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces.

In 1908, the mathematician Hermann Minkowski had an original idea in metaphysics regarding space and time. He was the first person to realize that spacetime is more fundamental than either time or space alone. As he put it, “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” The metaphysical assumption behind Minkowski’s remark is that what is “independently real” is what does not vary from one reference frame to another. What does not vary is their union, what we now call “spacetime.” It seems to follow that the division of events into the past ones, the present ones, and the future ones is also not “independently real.” One philosophical implication that Minkowski and Einstein accepted is that it’s an error to say, “Only my present is real.”

A coordinate system or reference frame is a way of representing space and time using numbers to represent spacetime points. Science confidently assigns numbers to times because, in any reference frame, the happens-before order-relation on events is faithfully reflected in the less-than order-relation on the time numbers (dates) that we assign to events. In the fundamental theories such as relativity and quantum mechanics, the values of the time variable t in any reference frame are real numbers, not merely rational numbers. Each number designates an instant of time, and time is a linear continuum of these instants ordered by the happens-before relation, similar to the mathematician’s line segment that is ordered by the less-than relation. Therefore, if these fundamental theories are correct, then physical time is one-dimensional rather than two-dimensional, and continuous rather than discrete. These features do not require time to be linear, however, because a segment of a circle is also a linear continuum, but there is no evidence for circular time, that is, for causal loops. Causal loops are worldlines that are closed curves in spacetime.

In mathematical physics, the ordering of instants by the happens-before relation, that is, by temporal precedence, is complete in the sense that there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Unlike physical objects, physical time is believed to be infinitely divisible--divisible in the sense of the actually infinite, not merely in Aristotle's sense of potentially infinite. Regarding the number of instants in any (non-zero) duration, time’s being a linear continuum implies the ordered instants are so densely packed that between any two there is a third, so that no instant has a next instant. In fact, time’s being a linear continuum implies that there is a nondenumerable infinity of instants between any two instants, that is, an aleph one number of instants. There is little doubt that the actual temporal structure of events can be embedded in the real numbers, but how about the converse? That is, to what extent is it known that the real numbers can be adequately embedded into the structure of the instants? The problem here is that, although time is not quantized in quantum theory, for times shorter than about 10-43 second (the so-called Planck time), science has no experimental grounds for the claim that between any two events there is a third. Instead, the justification of saying the reals can be embedded into an interval of instants is that the assumption of continuity is convenient and useful, and there are no known inconsistencies due to making this assumption, and that there are no better theories available.

Relativity theory challenges a great many of our intuitive beliefs about time. For events occurring at the same place, relativity theory implies the order is absolute (independent of the frame of reference) and so agrees with common sense, but for distant events occurring close enough in time to be in each other’s absolute elsewhere, event A can occur before event B in one reference frame, but after B in another frame, and simultaneously with B in yet another frame. For example, suppose you are sitting exactly in the middle of a moving train when lightning strikes simultaneously in the front and back of the train. You will know they were simultaneous if the light from the two strikes reaches you at the same time. But from the reference frame of a person standing still on the ground outside the train, the lightning strike at the back of the train happened first. From a frame fixed to a fast plane flying overhead in the same direction as the train and toward the front of the train, then the lightning strike at the front of the train really happened first. It was Einstein's original idea that all three judgments are correct. The event at the front of the train really did happen first, and it really did happen second, and it really did happen at the same time as the event at the back. It's all a matter of which reference frame is used to make the judgment. Philosophical realists infer from this that events in your absolute elsewhere are as real as any other events even though the only part of the universe that you can directly observe is your own past light cone, your backward cone.

Science impacts our understanding of time in other fundamental ways. Special relativity theory implies there is time dilation between one frame and another. For example, the faster a clock moves, the slower it runs, relative to stationary clocks. But this does not work just for clocks. If a human being moves fast, the human being also ages more slowly than someone who is stationary. Time dilation effects occur for tiny protons, too, but protons do not readily show the effects of their aging the way human bodies and clocks do.

Time dilation shows itself when a speeding twin returns to find that his (or her) Earth-bound twin has aged more rapidly. This surprising dilation result has caused some philosophers to question the consistency of relativity theory by arguing that, if motion is relative, then we could call the speeding twin “stationary” and it would follow that this twin is now the one who ages more rapidly. This argument is called the twin paradox. Experts now are agreed that the mistake is within the argument for the paradox, not within relativity theory. The twins feel different accelerations, so their two situations are not sufficiently similar to carry out the argument. The argument fails to notice the radically different relationships that each twin has to the rest of the universe as a whole. This is why one twin’s proper time is so different than the other’s.

[An object's proper time along its worldline, that is, along its path in 4-d spacetime, is the time elapsed by a clock having the same worldline. Coordinate time is the time measured by a clock at rest in the (inertial) frame. A clock isn't really measuring the time in a reference frame other than one fixed to the clock. In other words, a clock primarily measures the elapsed proper time between events that occur along its own worldline. Technically, a clock is a device that measures the spacetime interval along its own worldline. If the clock is at rest in an inertial frame, then it measures the "coordinate time." If the spacetime has no inertial frame then it can't have a normal coordinate time.]

There are two kinds of time dilation. Special relativity’s time dilation involves speed; general relativity’s also involves gravitational fields (and accelerations). Two ideally synchronized clocks need not stay in synchrony if they undergo different gravitational forces. This gravitational time dilation would be especially apparent if one of the two clocks were to approach a black hole. As a clock falls toward a black hole, time slows on approach to the event horizon, and it completely stops at the horizon (not just at the center of the hole)—relative to time on a clock that remains safely back on Earth.

If, as many physicists suspect, the microstructure of spacetime (near the Planck length which is much smaller than the diameter of a proton) is a quantum foam of changing curvature of spacetime with black holes forming and dissolving, then time loses its meaning at this small scale. The philosophical implication is that time exists only when we are speaking of regions large compared to the Planck length.

General Relativity theory may have even more profound implications for time. In 1948, the logician Kurt Gödel  discovered radical solutions to Einstein’s equations, solutions in which there are closed timelike curves due to the rotation of the universe’s matter, so that as one progresses forward in time along one of these curves one arrives back at one’s starting point. Gödel drew the conclusion that if matter is distributed so that there is Gödelian spacetime (that is, with a preponderance of galaxies rotating in one direction rather than another), then the universe has no linear time. There is no evidence that our universe has this rotation.

We’ve said little about quantum mechanics, but time reversibility is implied by quantum mechanics and not relativity theory. The process of falling into a black hole does not have an inverse process in relativity theory, but every quantum process has an inverse process, so the two major theories are inconsistent on this issue.

The Big Bang

The Big Bang is a violent explosion of spacetime that began billions of years ago. It is not an explosion within preexisting space; the explosion creates new space. The Big Bang theory in some form or other is accepted by the vast majority of astronomers, but it is not as firmly accepted as is the theory of relativity. Here is a quick story of its origin. In 1922, the Russian physicist Alexander Friedmann predicted from general relativity that the universe should be expanding. In 1925, the American astronomer Edwin Hubble made careful observations of clusters of galaxies and confirmed that they are undergoing a universal expansion, on average.

The Big Bang theory is a theory of how our universe evolved, how it expanded and cooled from this beginning. This beginning process is called the “Big Bang” and the expansion and cooling is continuing today. Atoms are not expanding; our solar system is not expanding; even the cluster of galaxies to which the Milky Way belongs is not expanding. But most every galaxy cluster is moving away from the others. It is as if the clusters are exploding away from each other, and in the future they will be very much farther away from each other. But the explosion is not occurring within space; the explosion is an explosion of space. Now, consider the past instead of the future. At any earlier moment the universe was more compact. Projecting to earlier and earlier times, and assuming that gravitation is the main force at work, the astronomers now conclude that 13.7 billion years ago (which happens to be three times the age of our planet) the universe was in a state of nearly zero size and infinite density. Because all substances cool when they expand, physicists believe the universe itself must have been cooling down over the last 13.7 billion years, and so it begin expanding when it was extremely hot. At present the average temperature of space in all very large regions has cooled to 2.7 Celsius degrees above absolute zero. Space is presently expanding at a rate of 71 kilometers per second per megaparsec, a rate that is increasing. A galaxy that is now 100 light years away from the Milky Way will, in another 13.7 billion years, be more than 200 light years away.

As far as we knew back in the 20th century, the entire universe was created in the Big Bang, and time itself came into existence “at that time.” So, the day of the Big Bang was a day without a yesterday. With the appearance of the new theories of quantum gravity in the 21st century, the question of what happened for the Big Bang has been resurrected as legitimate.

In the literature in both physics and philosophy, descriptions of the Big Bang often assume that a first event is also a first instant of time and that spacetime did not exist outside the Big Bang. This intimate linking of a first event with a first time is a philosophical move, not something demanded by the science. It is not even clear that it is correct to call the Big Bang an event. The Big Bang “event” is a singularity without space coordinates, but events normally must have space coordinates. One response to this problem is to alter the definition of “event” to allow the Big Bang to be an event. Another response, from James Hartle and Stephen Hawking, is to consider the past cosmic time-interval to be open rather than closed at t = 0. Looking back to the Big Bang is then like following the positive real numbers back to ever smaller positive numbers without ever reaching a smallest positive one. If Hartle and Hawking are correct that time is actually like this, then the universe had no beginning event.

Classical Big Bang theory is based on the assumption that the universal expansion of clusters of galaxies can be projected all the way back. Yet physicists agree that the projection must become untrustworthy in the Planck era, that is, for all times less than 10-43 second after the beginning of the Big Bang. Current science cannot speak with confidence about the nature of time within the Planck era. If a theory of quantum gravity does get confirmed, it should provide information about this Planck era, and it may even allow physicists to answer the question, “What caused the Big Bang?” and "Did anything happen before then?"

The scientifically radical, but theologically popular, answer, “God caused the Big Bang, but He, himself, does not exist in time” is a cryptic answer because it is not based on a well-justified and detailed theory of who God is, how He caused the Big Bang, and how He can exist but not be in time. It is also difficult to understand St. Augustine’s remark that “time itself was made by God.” On the other hand, for a person of faith, belief in their God is usually stronger than belief in any scientific hypothesis, or in any desire for a scientific justification of their remark about God, or in the importance of satisfying any philosopher’s demand for clarification.

Some physicists are advocating revision of the classical Big Bang theory in order to allow for the “cosmic landscape” or “multiverse,” in which there are multiple big bangs. See (Veneziano, 2006). But there is no external time in which these universes exist, which means that it is not sensible to speak of one universe occurring before or after any other within the multiverse. Also, in some of these universes there is no time dimension at all. However, this new theory is not generally accepted by theoretical cosmologists. Another cosmological theory is that the Big Bang represents a bounce from an earlier compression of the universe; there may be a sequence of bangs and crunches, and presently we are in a bang phase, that is, an expanding phase.

Infinite Time

clockThere are three ways to interpret the question of whether physical time is infinite: (a) Is time infinitely divisible? (b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? (c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past?

(a) Is time infinitely divisible? Yes, because general relativity and quantum mechanics require time to be a continuum. But the answer is no if these theories are eventually replaced by a relativistic quantum mechanics that quantizes time. “Although there have been suggestions that spacetime may have a discrete structure,” Stephen Hawking said in 1996, “I see no reason to abandon the continuum theories that have been so successful.”

(b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? Probably. According to the classical theory of the Big Bang, the answer depends on whether events will keep occurring. The best estimate from the cosmologists these days is that the expansion of the universe is accelerating and will continue forever. There always will be the events of galaxy clusters getting farther apart, even though gravity will continue to compact much of the matter into black holes, and so the future is potentially infinite.

(c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past? Aristotle argued “yes.” But by invoking the radical notion that God is “outside of time,” St. Augustine disagreed and said, “Time itself being part of God’s creation, there was simply no before!” (that is, no time before God created everything else but Himself). So, for theological reasons, Augustine declared time had a finite past. After advances in astronomy in the late 19th and early 20th centuries, the question of the age of the universe became a scientific question. With the acceptance of the classical Big Bang theory, the amount of past time was judged to be less than 14 billion years because this is when the Big Bang began. The assumption is that time does not exist independently of the spacetime relations exhibited by physical events. Recently, however, the classical Big Bang theory has been challenged. There could be an infinite amount of time in the past according to some proposed, but as yet untested, theories of quantum gravity based on the assumptions that general relativity theory fails to hold for infinitesimal volumes. These theories imply that the beginning of the Big Bang was actually an inflationary expansion from a pre-existing physical state. There was never a singularity. In that case our Big Bang could be just one bang among other bangs in a multiverse or landscape. If so, then is the past of this multiverse finite or infinite? Cosmologists do not agree on that issue. For a discussion of the controversies, see (Veneziano, 2006) and (Nadis, 2013).

There have been interesting speculations on how conscious life could continue forever, despite the fact that the available energy for life will decrease as the universe expands, and despite the fact that any life swept up into a black hole will reach the center of the hole in a finite time at which point death will be certain. For an introduction to these speculations, see (Krauss and Starkman, 2002).

Continuity of Time

In the classical theories of relativity and quantum mechanics, time is not quantized, but is a continuum. However, if certain, as yet untested, theories attempting to unify relativity and quantum mechanics are correct, then there is a shortest duration for any possible event (about 10-43 second), and time is digital rather than analog.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.

Back to the main "Time" article.

Rudolf Carnap: Modal Logic

carnap02In two works, a paper in The Journal of Symbolic Logic in 1946 and the book Meaning and Necessity in 1947, Rudolf Carnap developed a modal predicate logic containing a necessity operator N, whose semantics depends on the claim that, where α is a formula of the language, Nα represents the proposition that α is logically necessary. Carnap’s view was that Nα should be true if and only if α itself is logically valid, or, as he put it, is L-true. In the light of the criticisms of modal logic developed by W.V. Quine from 1943 on, the challenge for Carnap was how to produce a theory of validity for modal predicate logic in a way which enables an answer to be given to these criticisms. This article discusses Carnap’s motivation for developing a modal logic in the first place; and it then looks at how the modal predicate logic developed in his 1946 paper might be adapted to answer Quine’s objections. The adaptation is then compared with the way in which Carnap himself tried to answer Quine’s complaints in the 1947 book. Particular attention is paid to the problem of how to treat the meaning of formulas which contain a free individual variable in the scope of a modal operator, that is, to the problem of how to handle what Quine called the third grade of ‘modal involvement’.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Carnap’s Propositional Modal Logic
  3. Carnap’s (Non-Modal) Predicate Logic
  4. Carnap’s 1946 Modal Predicate Logic
  5. De Re Modality
  6. Individual Concepts
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

In an important article (Carnap 1946) and in a book a year later, (Carnap 1947), Rudolf Carnap articulated a system of modal logic. Carnap took himself to be doing two things; the first was to develop an account of the meaning of modal expressions; the second was to extend it to apply to what he called “modal functional logic” — that is, what we would call modal predicate logic or modal first-order logic. Carnap distinguishes between a logic or a ‘semantical system’, and a ‘calculus’, which is an axiomatic system, and states on p. 33 of 1946 that  “So far, no forms of MFC [modal functional calculus] have been constructed, and the construction of such a system is our chief aim.” In fact, in the preceding issue of The Journal of Symbolic Logic, the first presentation of Ruth Barcan’s axiomatic systems of modal predicate logic had already appeared, although they contained only an axiomatic presentation. (Barcan 1946.) The principal importance of Carnap’s work is thus his attempt to produce a semantics for modal predicate logic, and it is that concern that this article will focus on.

Nevertheless, first-order logic is founded on propositional logic, and Carnap first looks at non-modal propositional logic and modal propositional logic. I shall follow Carnap in using ~ and ∨ for negation and disjunction, though I shall use ∧ in place of Carnap’s ‘.’ for conjunction. Carnap takes these as primitive together with ‘t’ which stands for an arbitrary tautologous sentence. He recognises that ∧ and t can be defined in terms of ~ and ∨, but prefers to take them as primitive because of the importance to his presentation of conjunctive normal form. Carnap adopts the standard definitions of ⊃ and ≡. I will, however, deviate from Carnap’s notation by using Greek in place of German letters for metalinguistic symbols. In place of ‘valid’ Carnap speaks of L-true, and in place of ‘unsatisfiable’, L-false. α L-implies β iff (if and only if) α ⊃ β is valid. α and β are L-equivalent iff α ≡ β is valid.

One might at this stage ask what led Carnap to develop a modal logic at all. The clue here seems to be the influence of Wittgenstein. In his philosophical autobiography Carnap writes:

For me personally, Wittgenstein was perhaps the philosopher who, besides Russell and Frege, had the greatest influence on my thinking. The most important insight I gained from his work was the conception that the truth of logical statements is based only on their logical structure and on the meaning of the terms. Logical statements are true under all conceivable circumstances; thus their truth is independent of the contingent facts of the world. On the other hand, it follows that these statements do not say anything about the world and thus have no factual content. (Carnap 1963, p. 25)

Wittgenstein’s account of logical truth depended on the view that every (cognitively meaningful) sentence has truth conditions. (Wittgenstein 1921, 4.024.) Carnap certainly appears to have taken Wittgenstein’s remark as endorsing the truth-conditional theory of meaning. (See for instance Carnap 1947 p. 9.) If all logical truths are tautologies, and all tautologies are contentless, then you don’t need metaphysics to explain (logical) necessity.

One of the features of Wittgenstein’s view was that any way the world could be is determined by a collection of particular facts, where each such fact occupies a definite position in logical space, and where the way that position is occupied is independent of the way any other position of logical space is occupied. Such a world may be described in a logically perfect language, in which each atomic formula describes how a position of logical space is occupied. So suppose that we begin with this language, and instead of asking whether it reflects the structure of the world, we ask whether it is a useful language for describing the world. From Carnap’s perspective, (Carnap 1950) one might describe it in such a way as this. Given a language £ we may ask whether £ is adequate, or perhaps merely useful, for describing the world as we experience it. It is incoherent to speak about what the world in itself is like without presupposing that one is describing it. What makes £ a Carnapian equivalent of a logically perfect language would be that each of its atomic sentences is logically independent of any other atomic sentence, and that every possible world can be described by a state-description.

2. Carnap’s Propositional Modal Logic

In (non-modal) propositional logic the truth value of any well-formed formula (wff) is determined by an assignment of truth values to the atomic sentences. For Carnap an assignment of truth values to the atomic sentences is represented by what he calls a ‘state-description’. This term, like much in what follows, is only introduced at the predicate level (1946, p. 50) but it is less confusing to present it first for the propositional case, where a state-description, which I will refer to as s, is a class consisting of atomic wff or their negations, such that for each atomic wff p, exactly one of p or ~p is in s. (Here we may think of p as a propositional variable, or as a metalinguistic variable standing for an atomic wff.) Armed with a state-description s we may determine the truth of a wff α at s in the usual way, where s ╞ α means that α is true according to s, and s ╡ α means that not s ╞ α:

If α is atomic, then s ╞ α if α ∈ s, and s ╡ α if ~α ∈ s

s ╞ ~α iff s ╡ α

s ╞ α ∨ β iff s ╞ α or s ╞ β

s ╞ α ∧ β iff s ╞ α and s ╞ β

s ╞ t

This is not the way Carnap describes it. Carnap speaks of the range of a wff (p. 50). In Carnap’s terms the truth rules would be written:

If α is atomic then the range of α is those state-descriptions s such that α ∈ s.

Where V is the set of all state-descriptions, the range of ~α is V minus the range of α, that is, it is the class of those state-descriptions which are not in the range of α.

The range of α ∨ β is the range of α ∪ the range of β, that is, the class of state-descriptions which are either in the range of α or the range of β.

The range of α ∧ β is the range of α ∩ the range of β, that is, the class of state-descriptions which are in both the range of α and the range of β.

The range of t is V.

It should I hope be easy to see, first that Carnap’s way of putting things is equivalent to my use of s ╞ α, and second that these are in turn equivalent to the standard definitions of validity in terms of assignments of truth values.

By a ‘calculus’ Carnap means an axiomatic system, and he uses ‘PC’ to indicate any axiomatic system which is closed under modus ponens (the ‘rule of implication’, p. 38) and contains “‘t’ and all sentences formed by substitution from Bernays’s four axioms [See Hilbert and Ackermann, 1950, p. 28f] of the propositional calculus”. (loc cit.) Carnap notes that the soundness of this axiom system may be established in the usual way, and then shows how the possibility of reduction to conjunctive normal form (a method which Carnap, p. 38, calls P-reduction) may be used to prove completeness.

Modal logic is obtained by the addition of the sentential operator N. Carnap notes that N is equivalent to Lewis’s ~◊~. (Note that the □ symbol was not used by Lewis, but was invented by F.B. Fitch in 1945, and first appeared in print in Barcan 1946. It was not then known to Carnap.) Carnap tells us early in his article that “the guiding idea in our construction of systems of modal logic is this: a proposition p is logically necessary if and only if a sentence expressing p is logically true.” When this is turned into a definition in terms of truth in a state-description we get the following:

sNα iff sʹ ╞ α for every state-description sʹ.

This is because L-truth, or validity, means truth in every state-description. I shall refer to validity when N is interpreted in this way, as Carnap-validity, or C-validity. This account enables Carnap to address what was an important question at the time — what is the correct system of modal logic? While Carnap is clear that different systems of modal logic can reflect different views of the meaning of the necessity operators he is equally clear that, as he understands it, principles like NpNNp and ~NpN~Np are valid. It is easy to see that the validity of both these formulae follows easily from Carnap’s semantics for N. From this it is a short step to establishing that Carnap’s modal logic includes the principles of Lewis’s system S5, provided one takes the atomic wff to be propositional variables. However, we immediately run into a problem. Suppose that p is an atomic wff. Then there will be a state-description sʹ such that ~psʹ. And this means that for every state-description s, sNp, and so s ╞ ~Np. But this means that ~Np will be L-true. One can certainly have a system of modal logic in which this is so. An axiomatic basis and a completeness proof for the logic of C-validity occurs in Thomason 1973. (For comments on this feature of C-validity see also Makinson 1966 and Schurz 2001.) However, Carnap is clear that his system is equivalent to S5 (footnote 8, p. 41, and on p. 46.); and ~Np is not a theorem of S5. Further, the completeness theorem that Carnap proves, using normal forms, is a completeness proof for S5, based on Wajsberg 1933.

How then should this problem be addressed? Part of the answer is to look at Carnap’s attitude to propositional variables:

We here make use of ‘p’, ‘q’, and so forth, as auxiliary variables; that is to say they are merely used (following Quine) for the description of certain forms of sentences. (1946, p.41)

Quine 1934 suggests that the theorems of logic are always schemata. If so then we can define a wff α as what we might call QC-valid (Quine/Carnap valid) iff every substitution instance of α is C-valid. Wffs which are QC-valid are precisely the theorems of S5.

3. Carnap’s (Non-Modal) Predicate Logic

In presenting Carnap’s 1946 predicate logic (or as he prefers to call it ‘functional logic’, FL or FC depending on whether we are considering it semantically or axiomatically) I shall use ∀x in place of (x), and ∃x in place of (∃x). FL contains a denumerable infinity of individual constants, which I will often refer to simply as ‘constants’. Carnap uses the term ‘matrix’ for wff, and the term ‘sentence’ for closed wff, that is wff with no free variables. A state-description is as for propositional logic in containing only atomic sentences or their negations. Each of these will be a wff of the form or, where P is an n-place predicate and a1,..., an are n individual constants, not necessarily distinct.

To define truth in such a state-description Carnap proceeds a little differently from what is now common. In place of relativising the truth of an open formula to an assignment to the variables of individuals from a domain, Carnap assumes that every individual is denoted by one and only one individual constant, and he only defines truth for sentences. If s is any state-description, and α and β are any sentences, the rules for propositional modal logic can be extended by adding the following: if Pa1...ans and if ~Pa1...ans

sa = b iff a and b are the same constant

s ╞ ∀xα iff s ╞ α[a/x] for every constant a, where [α/x] is α with a replacing every free x.

Carnap produces the following axiomatic basis for first-order predicate logic, which he calls ‘FC’. In place of Carnap’s ( ) to indicate the universal closure of a wff, I shall use ∀, so that Carnap’s D8-1a (1946, p. 52) can be written as:

PC       ∀α where α is a PC-tautology

and so on. Carnap refers to axioms as ‘primitive sentences’ and in addition to PC, using more current names, we have:

       ∀(∀x(α ⊃ β) ⊃ (∀xα ⊃ ∀xβ))

VQ      ∀(α ⊃ ∀xα), where x is not free in α.

∀1a     ∀(∀x ⊃ α[y/x]), where α[y/x] is just like α except in having y in place of free x, where y is any variable for which x is free

∀1b     ∀(∀x ⊃ α[b/x]), where α[b/x] is just like α except in having b in place of free x, where b is any constant

I1         ∀x x = x

I2         ∀(x = y ⊃ (α ⊃ β)), where α and β are alike except that α has free x in 0 or more places where β has free y.

I3         ab where a and b are different constants.

The only transformation rule is modus ponens:

MP      ├ α, ├ α ⊃ β therefore ├ β

The only thing non-standard here, except perhaps for the restriction of theorems to closed wffs, is I3, which ensures that all state-descriptions are infinite, and, as Carnap points out on p. 53, validates ∃xy xy. It is possible to prove the completeness of this axiomatic system with respect to Carnap’s semantics.

4. Carnap’s 1946 Modal Predicate Logic

Perhaps the most important issue in Carnap’s modal logic is its connection with the criticisms of W.V. Quine. These criticisms were well known to Carnap who cites Quine 1943. Some years later, in Quine 1953b, Quine distinguishes three grades of what he calls ‘modal involvement’. The first grade he regards as innocuous. It is no more than the metalinguistic attribution of validity to a formula of non-modal logic. In the second grade we say that where α is any sentence then Nα is true iff α itself is valid — or logically true. On pp. 166-169 Quine argues that while such a procedure is possible it is unilluminating and misleading. The third grade applies to modal predicate logic, and allows free individual variables to occur in the scope of modal operators. It is this grade that Quine finds objectionable. One of the points at issue between Quine and Carnap arises when we introduce what are called definite descriptions into the language. Much of Carnap’s discussion in his other works — see especially Carnap 1947 — elevates descriptions to a central role, but in the 1946 paper these are not involved.

The extension of Carnap’s semantics to modal logic is exactly as in the propositional case:

sNα iff sʹ ╞ α for every state-description sʹ.

As before, a wff can be called C-valid iff it is true in every state-description, when ╞ satisfies the principle just stated. As in the propositional case if α is S5-valid then α is C-valid. However, also as in the propositional case, (quantified) S5 is not complete for C-validity. This is because, where Pa is an atomic wff, ~NPa is C-valid even though it is not a theorem of S5 — and similarly with any atomic wff. Unlike the propositional case it seems that this is a feature which Carnap welcomed in the predicate case, since he introduces some non-standard axioms.

The first set of axioms all form part of a standard basis for S5. They are as follows (p. 54, but with current names and notation):

LPCN  Where α is one of the LPC axioms PC-I3 then both α and Nα are axioms of MFC.

K         N∀(N(α ⊃ β) ⊃ (Nα ⊃ Nβ))

T         ∀(Nα ⊃ α)

5          N∀(Nα ∨ N~Nα)

BFC     N∀(Nxα ⊃ ∀xNα)

BF       N∀(∀xNα ⊃ Nxα)

The non-standard axioms, which show that he is attempting to axiomatise C-validity, are what Carnap calls ‘Assimilation’, ‘Variation and Generalization’ and ‘Substitution for Predicates’. (Carnap 1946, p. 54f.) In our notation these can be expressed as follows:

Ass      Nxyz1...∀zn((xz1 ∧ ... ∧ xzn) ⊃ (Nα ⊃ N α[y/x])), where α contains no free variables other than x, y, z1,..., zn, and no constants and no occurrences of =.

VG      Nxyz1...∀zn((xz1 ∧ ... ∧ xznyz1 ∧ ... ∧ yzn) ⊃ (Nα ⊃ N α[y/x]), where α contains no free variables other than x, y, z1,..., zn, and no constants.

SP       N∀(Nα ⊃ Nβ), where β is obtained from α by uniform substitution of a complex expression for a predicate.

None of these axiom schemata is easy to process, but it is not difficult to see what the simplest instances would look like. A very simple instance, which is of both Ass and VG is

AssP     Nxyz(xz ⊃ (NPxyzNPyyz))

To establish the validity of AssP it is sufficient to show that if a and c are distinct constants then NPabcNPbbc is valid. This is trivially so, since there is some s such that sPabc, and therefore for every s, sNPabc, and so, for every s, sNPabcPbbc. More telling is the case of SP. Let P be a one-place predicate and consider

SPP      Nx(NPxN(Px ∧ ~Px))

In this case α is Px, while β is Px ∧ ~Px, so that, in Carnap’s words, β ‘is formed from α by replacing every atomic matrix containing P by the current substitution form of β’. That is, where β is Px ∧ ~Px, it replaces α’s Px. If α had been more complex and contained Py as well as Px, then the replacement would have given Py ∧ ~ Py, and so on, where care needs to be taken to prevent any free variable being bound as a result of the replacement. In this case we have ├ ~N(Pa ∧ ~ Pa), and so ├ ~NPa.

In fact, although Carnap appears to have it in mind to axiomatise C-validity, it is easy to see that the predicate version is not recursively axiomatisable. For, where α is any LPC wff, α is not LPC-valid iff ~Nα is C-valid, and so, if C-validity were axiomatisable then LPC would be decidable. There is a hint on p. 57 that Carnap may have recognised this. He is certainly aware that the kind of reduction to normal form, with which he achieves the completeness of propositional S5, is unavailable in the predicate case, since it would lead to the decidability of LPC.

5. De Re Modality

What then can be said on the basis of Carnap 1946 to answer Quine’s complaints about modal predicate logic? Quine illustrates the problem in Quine 1943, pp. 119-121, and repeats versions of his argument many times, most famously perhaps in Quine 1953a, 1953b and 1960. The example  goes like this:

(1)                                9 is necessarily greater than 7

(2)                                The number of planets = 9


(3)                                The number of planets is necessarily greater than 7.

Carnap 1946 does not introduce definite descriptions into the language, so I shall present the argument in a formalisation which only uses the resources found there. I shall also simplify the discussion by using the predicate O, where Ox means ‘x is odd’, rather than the complex predicate ‘is greater than 7’. This will avoid reference to ‘7’, which is of no relevance to Quine’s argument. P means ‘is the number of the planets’, so that Px means ‘there are x-many planets’. With this in mind I take ‘9’ to be an individual constant, and use O and P to express (1) and (2) by

(4)                                NO9

(5)                                ∃x(Pxx = 9)

One could account for (4) by adding O9 as a meaning postulate in the sense of Carnap 1952, which would restrict the allowable state-descriptions to those which contain O9, though from some remarks on p. 201 of Carnap 1947 it seems that Carnap might have regarded both O and 9 as complex expressions defined by the resources of the Frege/Russell account of the natural numbers and their arithmetical properties. It also seems that he might have treated the numbers as higher-order entities referred to by higher-order expressions. If so then the necessity of arithmetical truths like (4) would derive from their analysis into logical truths. In my exposition I shall take the numerals as individual constants, and assume somehow that O9 is a logical truth, true in every state-description, and that therefore (4) is true.

In this formalisation I am ignoring the claim that the description ‘the number of the planets’ is intended to claim that there is only one such number. So much for the premises. But what about the conclusion? The problem is where to put the N. There are at least three possibilities:

(6)                                Nx(PxOx)

(7)                                ∃xN(PxOx)

(8)                                ∃x(PxNOx)

It is not difficult to show that (6) and (7) do not follow from (4) and (5). In contrast to (6) and (7), (8) does follow from (4) and (5), but there is no problem here, since (8) says that there is a necessarily odd number which is such that there happen to be that many planets. And this is true, because 9 is necessarily odd, and there are 9 planets. All of this should make clear how the phenomenon which upset Quine can be presented in the formal language of the 1946 article. Quine of course claims not to make sense of quantifying in. (See for instance the comments on Smullyan 1948 in Quine 1969, p. 338.)

6. Individual Concepts

Even if something like what has just been said might be thought to enable Carnap to answer Quine’s complaints about de re modality, it seems clear that Carnap had not availed himself of it in the 1947 book, and I shall now look at the modal logic presented in Carnap 1947. On p. 193f Carnap cites the argument (1)(2)(3) from Quine 1943 discussed above. He does not appear to recognise any potential ambiguity in the conclusion, and characterises (3) as false. Carnap doesn’t consider (8), and on p. 194 simply says:

“we obtain the false statement [(3)]”

In Carnap’s view the problem with Quine’s argument is that it assumes an unrestricted version of what is sometimes called ‘Leibniz’ Law’:

I2         ∀xy(x = y ⊃ (α ⊃ β)), where α and β differ only in that α has free x in 0 or more places where β has free y.

In the 1946 paper this law holds in full generality, as does a consequence of it which asserts the necessity of true identities.

LI        ∀xy(x = yNx = y)

For suppose LI fails. Then there would have to be a state-description ss in which for some constants a and b, sa = b but sNa = b. So there is a state-description sʹ such that sʹ ╡ a = b, but then, a and b are different constants, and so, sa = b, which gives a contradiction.

In the 1947 book Carnap holds that I2 must be restricted so that neither x nor y occur free in the scope of a modal operator. In particular the following would be ruled out as an allowable instance of I2:

(1)                                x = y ⊃ (NOxNOy)

In order to explain how this failure comes about, and solve the problems posed by co-referring singular terms, Carnap modifies the semantics of the 1946 paper. The principal difference from the modal logic of the 1946 paper, as Carnap tells us on p. 183, is that the domain of quantification for individual variables now consists of individual concepts, where an individual concept i is a function from state-descriptions to individual constants. Where s is a state-description, let is denote the constant which is the value of the function i for the state-description s. Carnap is clear that the quantifiers range over all individual concepts, not just those expressible in the language.

Using this semantics it is easy to see how (9) can fail. For let x have as its value the individual concept i, which is the function such that is is 9 for every state-description s, while the value of y is the function j such that, in any state-description s, js is the individual which is the number of the planets in s, that is, js is the (unique) constant a such that Pa is in s. (Assume that in each state-description there is a unique number, possibly 0, which satisfies P.) Assume that x = y is true in any state-description s iff, where i is the individual concept which is the value of x, and j is the individual concept which is the value of y, then is is the same individual constant as js. In the present example it happens that when s is the state-description which represents the actual world, is and js are indeed the same, for in s there are nine planets, making x = y true at s. Now NOx will be true if Ox is true in every state-description sʹ, which is to say if isʹ satisfies O in every sʹ. Since isʹ is 9 in every state-description then isʹ does satisfy O in every sʹ, and so NOx is true at s. But suppose sʹ represents a situation in which there are six planets. Then jsʹ will be 6 and so Oy will be false in sʹ, and for that reason NOy will be false in s, thus falsifying (9). (It is also easy to see that LI is not valid, since it is easy to have is = js even though ij.)

The difference between the modal semantics of Carnap 1946 and Carnap 1947 is that in the former the only individuals are the genuine individuals, represented by the constants of the language ℒ. In the proof of the invalidity of (9) it is essential that the semantics of identity require that when x is assigned an individual concept i and y is assigned an individual concept j that x = y be true at a state-description s iff is and js are the same individual. And now we come to Quine’s complaint (Quine 1953a, p. 152f). It is that Carnap replaces the domain of things as the range of the quantifiers with a domain of individual concepts. Quine then points out that the very same paradoxes arise again at the level of individual concepts. Thus for instance it might be that the individual concept which represents the number of planets in each state-description is identical with the first individual concept introduced on p. 193 of Meaning and Necessity. Carnap is alive to Quine’s criticism that ordinary individuals have been replaced in his ontology by individual concepts. In essence Carnap’s reply to Quine on pp. 198- 200 of Carnap 1947 is that if we restrict ourselves to purely extensional contexts then the entities which enter into the semantics are precisely the same entities as are the extensions of the intensions involved. What this amounts to is that although the domain of quantification consists of individual concepts, the arguments of the predicates are only the genuine individuals. For suppose, as Quine appears to have in mind, we permit predicates which apply to individual concepts. Then suppose that i and j are distinct individual concepts. Let P be a predicate which can apply to individual concepts, and let s be a state-description in which P applies to i but not to j but in which is and js are the same individual. We now have two options depending on how = is to be understood. If we take x = y to be true in s when is and js are the same individual then if x is assigned i and y is assigned j we would have that x = y and Px are both true in s, but Py is not. So that even the simplest instance of I2

I2P       x = y ⊃ (PxPy)

fails, and here there are no modal operators involved. The second option is to treat = as expressing a genuine identity. That is to say x = y is true only when the individual concept assigned to x is the same individual concept as the one assigned to y. In the example I have been discussing, since i and j are distinct individual concepts if i is assigned to x and j to y, then x = y will be false. But on this option the full version of I2 becomes valid even when α and β contain modal operators. This is just another version of Quine’s complaint that if an operator expresses identity then the terms of a true identity formula must be interchangeable in all contexts. Presumably Carnap thought that the use of individual concepts could address these worries. The present article makes no claims on whether or not an acceptable treatment of individual concepts is desirable, and if it is whether one can be developed.

7. References and Further Reading

This list contains all items referred to in the text, together with some other articles relevant to Carnap’s modal logic.

  • Barcan, (Marcus) R.C., 1946, A functional calculus of first order based on strict implication. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 11, 1–16.
  • Burgess, J.P., 1999, Which modal logic is the right one? Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 40, 81–93.
  • Carnap, R., 1937, The Logical Syntax of Language, London, Kegan Paul, Trench Truber.
  • Carnap, R., 1946, Modalities and quantification. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 11, 33–64.
  • Carnap, R., 1947, Meaning and Necessity, Chicago, University of Chicago Press (Second edition 1956, references are to the second edition.).
  • Carnap, R., 1950, Empiricism, semantics and ontology. Revue Intern de Phil. 4, pp. 20–40 (Reprinted in the second edition of Carnap 1947, pp. 2052–2221. Page references are to this reprint.).
  • Carnap, R., 1952, Meaning postulates. Philosophical Studies, 3, pp. 65–73. (Reprinted in the second edition of Carnap 1947, pp. 222–229. Page references are to this reprint.)
  • Carnap, R., 1963, The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, ed P.A. Schilpp, La Salle, Ill., Open Court, pp. 3–84.
  • Church, A., 1973, A revised formulation of the logic of sense and denotation (part I). Noũs, 7, pp. 24–33.
  • Cocchiarella, N.B., 1975a, On the primary and secondary semantics of logical necessity. Journal of Philosophical Logic, 4, pp. 13–27..
  • Cocchiarella, N.B.,1975b, Logical atomism, nominalism, and modal logic. Synthese, 31, pp. 23−67.
  • Cresswell, M.J., 2013, Carnap and McKinsey: Topics in the pre–history of possible worlds semantics. Proceedings of the 12th Asian Logic Conference, J. Brendle, R. Downey, R. Goldblatt and B. Kim (eds), World Scientific, pp. 53-75.
  • Garson, J.W., 1980, Quantification in modal logic. Handbook of Philosophical Logic, ed. D.M. Gabbay and F. Guenthner, Dordrecht, Reidel, Vol. II, Ch. 5, 249-307
  • Gottlob, G., 1999, Remarks on a Carnapian extension of S5. In J. Wolenski, E. Köhler (eds.), Alfred Tarski and the Vienna Circle, Kluwer, Dordrecht, 243−259.
  • Hilbert, D., and W. Ackermann, 1950, Mathematical Logic, New York, Chelsea Publishing Co., (Translation of Grundzüge der Theoretischen Logik.).
  • Hughes, G.E., and M.J. Cresswell, 1996, A New Introduction to Modal Logic, London, Routledge.
  • Lewis, C.I., and C.H. Langford, 1932, Symbolic Logic, New York, Dover publications.
  • Makinson, D., 1966, How meaningful are modal operators? Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 44, 331−337.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1934, Ontological remarks on the propositional calculus. Mind, 433, pp. 473– 476.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1943, Notes on existence and necessity, The Journal of Philosophy, Vol 40, pp. 113-127.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1953a, Reference and modality. From a Logical Point of View, Cambridge, Mass., Harvard University Press, second edition 1961, pp. 139–59.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1953b, Three grades of modal involvement, The Ways of Paradox, Cambridge Mass., Harvard University Press, 1976, pp. 158–176.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1960, Word and Object, Cambridge, Mass, MIT Press.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1969, Reply to Sellars. Words and Objections, (ed D. Davidson and K.J.J. Hintikka), Dordrecht, Reidel, 1969, pp. 337–340.
  • Schurz, G., 2001, Carnap’s modal logic. In W. Stelzner and M. Stockler (eds.), Zwischen traditioneller und moderner Logik. Paderborn, Mentis, pp. 365–380.
  • Smullyan, A.F., 1948, Modality and description. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 13, 31–7.
  • Thomason, S. K.,1973, New Representation of S5. Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 14, 281−284.
  • Wajsberg, M., 1933, Ein erweiteter Klassenkalkül. Monatshefte für Mathematik und Physik, Vol. 40, 113–26.
  • Wittgenstein, L., 1921, Tractatus Logic-Philosophicus. (Translated by D.F.Pears and B.F.McGinness), 2nd printing 1963. London, Routledge and Kegan Paul.


Author Information

M. J. Cresswell
Victoria University of Wellington
New Zealand


The word “argument” can be used to designate a dispute or a fight, or it can be used more technically. The focus of this article is on understanding an argument as a collection of truth-bearers (that is, the things that bear truth and falsity, or are true and false) some of which are offered as reasons for one of them, the conclusion. This article takes propositions rather than sentences or statements or utterances to be the primary truth bearers. The reasons offered within the argument are called “premises”, and the proposition that the premises are offered for is called the “conclusion”. This sense of “argument” diverges not only from the above sense of a dispute or fight but also from the formal logician’s sense according to which an argument is merely a list of statements, one of which is designated as the conclusion and the rest of which are designated as premises regardless of whether the premises are offered as reasons for believing the conclusion. Arguments, as understood in this article, are the subject of study in critical thinking and informal logic courses in which students usually learn, among other things, how to identify, reconstruct, and evaluate arguments given outside the classroom.

Arguments, in this sense, are typically distinguished from both implications and inferences. In asserting that a proposition P implies proposition Q, one does not thereby offer P as a reason for Q. The proposition frogs are mammals implies that frogs are not reptiles, but it is problematic to offer the former as a reason for believing the latter. If an arguer offers an argument in order to persuade an audience that the conclusion is true, then it is plausible to think that the arguer is inviting the audience to make an inference from the argument’s premises to its conclusion. However, an inference is a form of reasoning, and as such it is distinct from an argument in the sense of a collection of propositions (some of which are offered as reasons for the conclusion). One might plausibly think that a person S infers Q from P just in case S comes to believe Q because S believes that P is true and because S believes that the truth of P justifies belief that Q. But this movement of mind from P to Q is something different from the argument composed of just P and Q.

The characterization of argument in the first paragraph requires development since there are forms of reasoning such as explanations which are not typically regarded as arguments even though (explanatory) reasons are offered for a proposition. Two principal approaches to fine-tuning this first-step characterization of arguments are what may be called the structural and pragmatic approaches. The pragmatic approach is motivated by the view that the nature of an argument cannot be completely captured in terms of its structure. In what follows, each approach is described, and criticism is briefly entertained.  Along the way, distinctive features of arguments are highlighted that seemingly must be accounted for by any plausible characterization. The classification of arguments as deductive, inductive, and conductive is discussed in section 3.

Table of Contents

  1. The Structural Approach to Characterizing Arguments
  2. The Pragmatic Approach to Characterizing Arguments
  3. Deductive, Inductive, and Conductive Arguments
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Structural Approach to Characterizing Arguments

Not any group of propositions qualifies as an argument. The starting point for structural approaches is the thesis that the premises of an argument are reasons offered in support of its conclusion (for example, Govier 2010, p.1, Bassham, G., W. Irwin, H. Nardone, J. Wallace 2005, p.30, Copi and Cohen 2005, p.7; for discussion, see Johnson 2000, p.146ff ). Accordingly, a collection of propositions lacks the structure of an argument unless there is a reasoner who puts forward some as reasons in support of one of them. Letting P1, P2, P3, …, and C range over propositions and R over reasoners, a structural characterization of argument takes the following form.

 A collection of propositions, P1, …, Pn, C, is an argument if and only if there is a reasoner R who puts forward the Pi as reasons in support of C.

The structure of an argument is not a function of the syntactic and semantic features of the propositions that compose it. Rather, it is imposed on these propositions by the intentions of a reasoner to use some as support for one of them. Typically in presenting an argument, a reasoner will use expressions to flag the intended structural components of her argument. Typical premise indicators include: “because”, “since”, “for”, and “as”; typical conclusion indicators include “therefore”, “thus”, “hence”, and “so”. Note well: these expressions do not always function in these ways, and so their mere use does not necessitate the presence of an argument.

Different accounts of the nature of the intended support offered by the premises for the conclusion in an argument generate different structural characterizations of arguments (for discussion see Hitchcock 2007). Plausibly, if a reasoner R puts forward premises in support of a conclusion C, then (i)-(iii) obtain. (i) The premises represent R’s reasons for believing that the conclusion is true and R thinks that her belief in the truth of the premises is justified. (ii) R believes that the premises make C more probable than not. (iii) (a) R believes that the premises are independent of C ( that is, R thinks that her reasons for the premises do not include belief that C is true), and (b) R believes that the premises are relevant to establishing that C is true. If we judge that a reasoner R presents an argument as defined above, then by the lights of (i)-(iii) we believe that R believes that the premises justify belief in the truth of the conclusion.  In what immediately follows, examples are given to explicate (i)-(iii).

A: John is an only child.

B: John is not an only child; he said that Mary is his sister.

If B presents an argument, then the following obtain. (i) B believes that the premise ( that is, Mary is John’s sister) is true, B thinks this belief is justified, and the premise is B’s reason for maintaining the conclusion. (ii) B believes that John said that Mary is his sister makes it more likely than not that John is not an only child, and (iii) B thinks that that John said that Mary is his sister is both independent of the proposition that Mary is John’s sister and relevant to confirming it.

A: The Democrats and Republicans don’t seem willing to compromise.

B: If the Democrats and Republicans are not willing to compromise, then the U.S. will go over the fiscal cliff.

B’s assertion of a conditional does not require that B believe either the antecedent or consequent. Therefore, it is unlikely that B puts forward the Democrats and Republicans are not willing to compromise as a reason in support of the U.S. will go over the fiscal cliff, because it is unlikely that B believes either proposition. Hence, it is unlikely that B’s response to A has the structure of an argument, because (i) is not satisfied.

A: Doctor B, what is the reason for my uncle’s muscular weakness?

B: The results of the test are in. Even though few syphilis patients get paresis, we suspect that the reason for your uncle’s paresis is the syphilis he suffered from 10 years ago.

Dr. B offers reasons that explain why A’s uncle has paresis. It is unreasonable to think that B believes that the uncle’s being a syphilis victim makes it more likely than not that he has paresis, since B admits that having syphilis does not make it more likely than not that someone has (or will have) paresis. So, B’s response does not contain an argument, because (ii) is not satisfied.

A: I don’t think that Bill will be at the party tonight.

B: Bill will be at the party, because Bill will be at the party.

Suppose that B believes that Bill will be at the party. Trivially, the truth of this proposition makes it more likely than not that he will be at the party. Nevertheless, B is not presenting an argument.  B’s response does not have the structure of an argument, because (iiia) is not satisfied. Clearly, B does not offer a reason for Bill will be at the party that is independent of this. Perhaps, B’s response is intended to communicate her confidence that Bill will be at the party. By (iiia), a reasoner R puts forward [1] Sasha Obama has a sibling in support of [2] Sasha is not an only child only if R’s reasons for believing [1] do not include R’s belief that [2] is true. If R puts forward [1] in support of [2] and, say, erroneously believes that the former is independent of the latter, then R’s argument would be defective by virtue of being circular. Regarding (iiib), that Obama is U.S. President entails that the earth is the third planet from the sun or it isn’t, but it is plausible to suppose that the former does not support the latter because it is irrelevant to showing that the earth is the third planet from the sun or it isn’t is true.

Premises offered in support of a conclusion are either convergent or divergent. This difference marks a structural distinction between arguments.

[1] Tom is happy only if he is playing guitar.
[2] Tom is not playing guitar.
[3] Tom is not happy.

Suppose that a reasoner R offers [1] and [2] as reasons in support of [3]. The argument is presented in what is called standard form; the premises are listed first and a solid line separates them from the conclusion, which is prefaced by “”. This symbol means “therefore”. Premises [1] and [2] are convergent because they do not support the conclusion independently of one another,  that is, they support the conclusion jointly. It is unreasonable to think that R offers [1] and [2] individually, as opposed to collectively, as reasons for [3]. The following representation of the argument depicts the convergence of the premises.


Combining [1] and [2] with the plus sign and underscoring them indicates that they are convergent. The arrow indicates that they are offered in support of [3]. To see a display of divergent premises, consider the following.

[1] Tom said that he didn’t go to Samantha’s party.
[2] No one at Samantha’s party saw Tom there.
[3] Tom did not attend Samantha’s party.

These premises are divergent, because each is a reason that supports [3] independently of the other. The below diagram represents this.


An extended argument is an argument with at least one premise that a reasoner attempts to support explicitly. Extended arguments are more structurally complex than ones that are not extended. Consider the following.

The keys are either in the kitchen or the bedroom. The keys are not in the kitchen. I did not find the keys in the kitchen. So, the keys must be in the bedroom. Let’s look there!

The argument in standard form may be portrayed as follows:

[1] I just searched the kitchen and I did not find the keys.
[2] The keys are not in the kitchen.
[3] The keys are either in the kitchen or the bedroom.
[4] The keys are in the bedroom.


Note that although the keys being in the bedroom is a reason for the imperative, “Let’s look there!” (given the desirability of finding the keys), this proposition is not “truth apt” and so is not a component of the argument.

An enthymeme is an argument which is presented with at least one component that is suppressed.

A: I don’t know what to believe regarding the morality of abortion.

B: You should believe that abortion is immoral. You’re a Catholic.

That B puts forward [1] A is a Catholic in support of [2] A should believe that abortion is immoral suggests that B implicitly puts forward [3] all Catholics should believe that abortion is immoral in support of [2]. Proposition [3] may plausibly be regarded as a suppressed premise of B’s argument. Note that [2] and [3] are convergent. A premise that is suppressed is never a reason for a conclusion independent of another explicitly offered for that conclusion.

There are two main criticisms of structural characterizations of arguments. One criticism is that they are too weak because they turn non-arguments such as explanations into arguments.

A: Why did this metal expand?

B: It was heated and all metals expand when heated.

B offers explanatory reasons for the explanandum (what is explained): this metal expanded. It is plausible to see B offering these explanatory reasons in support of the explanandum. The reasons B offers jointly support the truth of the explanandum, and thereby show that the expansion of the metal was to be expected. It is in this way that B’s reasons enable A to understand why the metal expanded.

The second criticism is that structural characterizations are too strong. They rule out as arguments what intuitively seem to be arguments.

A: Kelly maintains that no explanation is an argument. I don’t know what to believe.

B: Neither do I. One reason for her view may be that the primary function of arguments, unlike explanations, is persuasion. But I am not sure that this is the primary function of arguments. We should investigate this further.

B offers a reason, [1] the primary function of arguments, unlike explanations, is persuasion, for the thesis [2] no explanation is an argument. Since B asserts neither [1] nor [2], B does not put forward [1] in support of [2]. Hence, by the above account, B’s reasoning does not qualify as an argument. A contrary view is that arguments can be used in ways other than showing that their conclusions are true. For example, arguments can be constructed for purposes of inquiry and as such can be used to investigate a hypothesis by seeing what reasons might be given to support a given proposition (see Meiland 1989 and Johnson and Blair 2006, p.10). Such arguments are sometimes referred to as exploratory arguments.  On this approach, it is plausible to think that B constructs an exploratory argument [exercise for the reader: identify B’s suppressed premise].

Briefly, in defense of the structuralist account of arguments one response to the first criticism is to bite the bullet and follow those who think that at least some explanations qualify as arguments (see Thomas 1986 who argues that all explanations are arguments). Given that there are exploratory arguments, the second criticism motivates either liberalizing the concept of support that premises may provide for a conclusion (so that, for example, B may be understood as offering [1] in support of [2]) or dropping the notion of support all together in the structural characterization of arguments (for example, a collection of propositions is an argument if and only if a reasoner offers some as reasons for one of them. See Sinnott-Armstrong and Fogelin 2010, p.3).

2. The Pragmatic Approach to Characterizing Arguments

The pragmatic approach is motivated by the view that the nature of an argument cannot be completely captured in terms of its structure. In contrast to structural definitions of arguments, pragmatic definitions appeal to the function of arguments. Different accounts of the purposes arguments serve generate different pragmatic definitions of arguments. The following pragmatic definition appeals to the use of arguments as tools of rational persuasion (for definitions of argument that make such an appeal, see Johnson 2000, p. 168; Walton 1996, p. 18ff; Hitchcock 2007, p.105ff)

A collection of propositions is an argument if and only if there is a reasoner R who puts forward some of them (the premises) as reasons in support of one of them (the conclusion) in order to rationally persuade an audience of the truth of the conclusion.

One advantage of this definition over the previously given structural one is that it offers an explanation why arguments have the structure they do. In order to rationally persuade an audience of the truth of a proposition, one must offer reasons in support of that proposition. The appeal to rational persuasion is necessary to distinguish arguments from other forms of persuasion such as threats. One question that arises is: What obligations does a reasoner incur by virtue of offering supporting reasons for a conclusion in order to rationally persuade an audience of the conclusion? One might think that such a reasoner should be open to criticisms and obligated to respond to them persuasively (See Johnson 2000 p.144 et al, for development of this idea). By appealing to the aims that arguments serve, pragmatic definitions highlight the acts of presenting an argument in addition to the arguments themselves. The field of argumentation, an interdisciplinary field that includes rhetoric, informal logic, psychology, and cognitive science, highlights acts of presenting arguments and their contexts as topics for investigation that inform our understanding of arguments (see Houtlosser 2001 for discussion of the different perspectives of argument offered by different fields).

For example, the acts of explaining and arguing—in sense highlighted here—have different aims.  Whereas the act of explaining is designed to increase the audience’s comprehension, the act of arguing is aimed at enhancing the acceptability of a standpoint. This difference in aim makes sense of the fact that in presenting an argument the reasoner believes that her standpoint is not yet acceptable to her audience, but in presenting an explanation the reasoner knows or believes that the explanandum is already accepted by her audience (See van Eemeren and Grootendorst 1992, p.29, and Snoeck Henkemans 2001, p.232). These observations about the acts of explaining and arguing motivate the above pragmatic definition of an argument and suggest that arguments and explanations are distinct things. It is generally accepted that the same line of reasoning can function as an explanation in one dialogical context and as an argument in another (see Groarke and Tindale 2004, p. 23ff for an example and discussion). Eemeren van, Grootendorst, and Snoeck Henkemans 2002 delivers a substantive account of how the evaluation of various types of arguments turns on considerations pertaining to the dialogical contexts within which they are presented and discussed.

Note that, since the pragmatic definition appeals to the structure of propositions in characterizing arguments, it inherits the criticisms of structural definitions. In addition, the question arises whether it captures the variety of purposes arguments may serve. It has been urged that arguments can aim at engendering any one of a full range of attitudes towards their conclusions (for example, Pinto 1991). For example, a reasoner can offer premises for a conclusion C in order to get her audience to withhold assent from C, suspect that C is true, believe that is merely possible that C is true, or to be afraid that C is true.

The thought here is that these are alternatives to convincing an audience of the truth of C. A proponent of a pragmatic definition of argument may grant that there are uses of arguments not accounted for by her definition, and propose that the definition is stipulative. But then a case needs to be made why theorizing about arguments from a pragmatic approach should be anchored to such a definition when it does not reflect all legitimate uses of arguments. Another line of criticism of the pragmatic approach is its rejecting that arguments themselves have a function (Goodwin 2007) and arguing that the function of persuasion should be assigned to the dialogical contexts in which arguments take place (Doury 2011).

3. Deductive, Inductive, and Conductive Arguments

Arguments are commonly classified as deductive or inductive (for example, Copi, I. and C. Cohen 2005, Sinnott-Armstrong and Fogelin 2010). A deductive argument is an argument that an arguer puts forward as valid. For a valid argument, it is not possible for the premises to be true with the conclusion false. That is, necessarily if the premises are true, then the conclusion is true. Thus we may say that the truth of the premises in a valid argument guarantees that the conclusion is also true. The following is an example of a valid argument: Tom is happy only if the Tigers win, the Tigers lost; therefore, Tom is definitely not happy.

A step-by-step derivation of the conclusion of a valid argument from its premises is called a proof. In the context of a proof, the given premises of an argument may be viewed as initial premises. The propositions produced at the steps leading to the conclusion are called derived premises. Each step in the derivation is justified by a principle of inference. Whether the derived premises are components of a valid argument is a difficult question that is beyond the scope of this article.   

An inductive argument is an argument that an arguer puts forward as inductively strong. In an inductive argument, the premises are intended only to be so strong that, if they were true, then it would be unlikely, although possible, that the conclusion is false. If the truth of the premises makes it unlikely (but not impossible) that the conclusion is false, then we may say that the argument is inductively strong. The following is an example of an inductively strong argument: 97% of the Republicans in town Z voted for McX, Jones is a Republican in town Z; therefore, Jones voted for McX.

In an argument like this, an arguer often will conclude "Jones probably voted for McX" instead of "Jones voted for McX," because they are signaling with the word "probably" that they intend to present an argument that is inductively strong but not valid.

In order to evaluate an argument it is important to determine whether or not it is deductive or inductive. It is inappropriate to criticize an inductively strong argument for being invalid. Based on the above characterizations, whether an argument is deductive or inductive turns on whether the arguer intends the argument to be valid or merely inductively strong, respectively. Sometimes the presence of certain expressions such as ‘definitely’ and ‘probably’ in the above two arguments indicate the relevant intensions of the arguer. Charity dictates that an invalid argument which is inductively strong be evaluated as an inductive argument unless there is clear evidence to the contrary.

Conductive arguments have been put forward as a third category of arguments (for example, Govier 2010). A conductive argument is an argument whose premises are divergent; the premises count separately in support of the conclusion. If one or more premises were removed from the argument, the degree of support offered by the remaining premises would stay the same. The previously given example of an argument with divergent premises is a conductive argument. The following is another example of a conductive argument. It most likely won’t rain tomorrow. The sky is red tonight. Also, the weather channel reported a 30% chance of rain for tomorrow.

The primary rationale for distinguishing conductive arguments from deductive and inductive ones is as follows. First, the premises of conductive arguments are always divergent, but the premises of deductive and inductive arguments are never divergent. Second, the evaluation of arguments with divergent premises requires not only that each premise be evaluated individually as support for the conclusion, but also the degree to which the premises support the conclusion collectively must be determined. This second consideration mitigates against treating conductive arguments merely as a collection of subarguments, each of which is deductive or inductive. The basic idea is that the support that the divergent premises taken together provide the conclusion must be considered in the evaluation of a conductive argument. With respect to the above conductive argument, the sky is red tonight and the weather channel reported a 30% chance of rain for tomorrow are offered together as (divergent) reasons for It most likely won’t rain tomorrow. Perhaps, collectively, but not individually, these reasons would persuade an addressee that it most likely won’t rain tomorrow.

4. Conclusion

A group of propositions constitutes an argument only if some are offered as reasons for one of them. Two approaches to identifying the definitive characteristics of arguments are the structural and pragmatic approaches. On both approaches, whether an act of offering reasons for a proposition P yields an argument depends on what the reasoner believes regarding both the truth of the reasons and the relationship between the reasons and P. A typical use of an argument is to rationally persuade its audience of the truth of the conclusion. To be effective in realizing this aim, the reasoner must think that there is real potential in the relevant context for her audience to be rationally persuaded of the conclusion by means of the offered premises. What, exactly, this presupposes about the audience depends on what the argument is and the context in which it is given. An argument may be classified as deductive, inductive, or conductive. Its classification into one of these categories is a prerequisite for its proper evaluation.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bassham, G., W. Irwin, H. Nardone, and J. Wallace. 2005. Critical Thinking: A Student’s Introduction, 2nd ed. New York: McGraw-Hill.
  • Copi, I. and C. Cohen 2005. Introduction to Logic 12th ed. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Doury, M. 2011. “Preaching to the Converted: Why Argue When Everyone Agrees?” Argumentation26(1): 99-114.
  • Eemeren F.H. van, R. Grootendorst, and F. Snoeck Henkemans. 2002. Argumentation: Analysis, Evaluation, Presentation. 2002. Mahwah, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.
  • Eemeren F.H. van and R. Grootendorst. 1992. Argumentation, Communication, and Fallacies: A Pragma-Dialectical Perspective. Hillsdale, NJ: Lawrence Erblaum Associates.
  • Goodwin, J. 2007. “Argument has no function.” Informal Logic 27 (1): 69–90.
  • Govier, T. 2010. A Practical Study of Argument, 7th ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • Govier, T. 1987. “Reasons Why Arguments and Explanations are Different.” In Problems in Argument Analysis and Evaluation, Govier 1987, 159-176. Dordrecht, Holland: Foris.
  • Groarke, L. and C. Tindale 2004. Good Reasoning Matters!: A Constructive Approach to Critical Thinking, 3rd ed. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hitchcock, D. 2007. “Informal Logic and The Concept of Argument.” In Philosophy of Logic. D. Jacquette 2007, 101-129. Amsterdam: Elsevier.
  • Houtlosser, P. 2001. “Points of View.” In Critical Concepts in Argumentation Theory, F.H. van Eemeren 2001, 27-50. Amsterdam: Amsterdam University Press.
  • Johnson, R. and J. A. Blair 2006. Logical Self-Defense. New York: International Debate Education Association.
  • Johnson, R. 2000. Manifest Rationality. Mahwah, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.
  • Kasachkoff, T. 1988. “Explaining and Justifying.” Informal Logic X, 21-30.
  • Meiland, J. 1989. “Argument as Inquiry and Argument as Persuasion.” Argumentation 3, 185-196.
  • Pinto, R. 1991. “Generalizing the Notion of Argument.” In Argument, Inference and Dialectic, R. Pinto (2010), 10-20. Dordrecht, Holland: Kluwer Academic Publishers. Originally published in van Eemeren, Grootendorst, Blair, and Willard, eds. Proceedings of the Second International Conference on Argumentation, vol.1A, 116-124. Amsterdam: SICSAT. Pinto, R.1995. “The Relation of Argument to Inference,” pp. 32-45 in Pinto (2010).
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. and R. Fogelin. 2010. Understanding Arguments: An Introduction to Informal Logic, 8th ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • Skyrms, B. 2000. Choice and Chance, 4th ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • Snoeck Henkemans, A.F. 2001. "Argumentation, explanation, and causality." In Text Representation: Linguistic and Psycholinguistic Aspects, T. Sanders, J. Schilperoord, and W. Spooren, eds. 2001, 231-246. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing.
  • Thomas, S.N. 1986. Practical Reasoning in Natural Language. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Walton, D. 1996. Argument Structure: A Pragmatic Theory. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.

Author Information

Matthew McKeon
Michigan State University
U. S. A.

Deductive and Inductive Arguments

deductive argument is an argument that is intended by the arguer to be (deductively) valid, that is, to provide a guarantee of the truth of the conclusion provided that the argument's premises (assumptions) are true. This point can be expressed also by saying that, in a deductive argument, the premises are intended to provide such strong support for the conclusion that, if the premises are true, then it would be impossible for the conclusion to be false. An argument in which the premises do succeed in guaranteeing the conclusion is called a (deductively) valid argument. If a valid argument has true premises, then the argument is said to be sound.

Here is a valid deductive argument: It's sunny in Singapore. If it's sunny in Singapore, he won't be carrying an umbrella. So, he won't be carrying an umbrella.

Here is a mildly strong inductive argument: Every time I've walked by that dog, he hasn't tried to bite me. So, the next time I walk by that dog he won't try to bite me.

An inductive argument is an argument that is intended by the arguer merely to establish or increase the probability of its conclusion. In an inductive argument, the premises are intended only to be so strong that, if they were true, then it would be unlikely that the conclusion is false. There is no standard term for a successful inductive argument. But its success or strength is a matter of degree, unlike with deductive arguments. A deductive argument is valid or else invalid.

The difference between the two kinds of arguments does not lie solely in the words used; it comes from the relationship the author or expositor of the argument takes there to be between the premises and the conclusion. If the author of the argument believes that the truth of the premises definitely establishes the truth of the conclusion (due to definition, logical entailment, logical structure, or mathematical necessity), then the argument is deductive. If the author of the argument does not think that the truth of the premises definitely establishes the truth of the conclusion, but nonetheless believes that their truth provides good reason to believe the conclusion true, then the argument is inductive.

Some analysts prefer to distinguish inductive arguments from conductive arguments; the latter are arguments giving explicit reasons for and against a conclusion, and requiring the evaluator of the argument to weigh these considerations, i.e., to consider the pros and cons. This article considers conductive arguments to be a kind of inductive argument.

The noun "deduction" refers to the process of advancing or establishing a deductive argument, or going through a process of reasoning that can be reconstructed as a deductive argument. "Induction" refers to the process of advancing an inductive argument, or making use of reasoning that can be reconstructed as an inductive argument.

Because deductive arguments are those in which the truth of the conclusion is thought to be completely guaranteed and not just made probable by the truth of the premises, if the argument is a sound one, then the truth of the conclusion is said to be "contained within" the truth of the premises; that is, the conclusion does not go beyond what the truth of the premises implicitly requires. For this reason, deductive arguments are usually limited to inferences that follow from definitions, mathematics and rules of formal logic. Here is a deductive argument:

John is ill. If John is ill, then he won't be able to attend our meeting today. Therefore, John won't be able to attend our meeting today.

That argument is valid due to its logical structure. If 'ill' were replaced with 'happy', the argument would still be valid because it would retain its special logical structure (called modus ponens). Here is the form of any argument having the structure of modus ponens:


If P then Q

So, Q

The capital letters stand for declarative sentences, or statements, or propositions. The investigation of these logical forms is called Propositional Logic.

The question of whether all, or merely most, valid deductive arguments are valid because of their structure is still controversial in the field of the philosophy of logic, but that question will not be explored further in this article.

Inductive arguments can take very wide ranging forms. Inductive arguments might conclude with some claim about a group based only on information from a sample of that group. Other inductive arguments draw conclusions by appeal to evidence or authority or causal relationships. Here is a somewhat strong inductive argument based on authority:

The police said John committed the murder. So, John committed the murder.

Here is an inductive argument based on evidence:

The witness said John committed the murder. So, John committed the murder.

Here is a stronger inductive argument based on better evidence:

Two independent witnesses claimed John committed the murder. John's fingerprints are the only ones on the murder weapon. John confessed to the crime. So, John committed the murder.

This last argument is no doubt good enough for a jury to convict John, but none of these three arguments about John committing the murder is strong enough to be called valid. At least itt is not valid in the technical sense of 'deductively valid'. However, some lawyers will tell their juries that these are valid arguments, so we critical thinkers need to be on the alert as to how people around us are using the term.

It is worth noting that some dictionaries and texts improperly define "deduction" as reasoning from the general to specific and define "induction" as reasoning from the specific to the general. These definitions are outdated and inaccurate. For example, according to the more modern definitions given above, the following argument from the specific to general is deductive, not inductive, because the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion:

The members of the Williams family are Susan, Nathan and Alexander.
Susan wears glasses.
Nathan wears glasses.
Alexander wears glasses.
Therefore, all members of the Williams family wear glasses.

Moreover, the following argument, even though it reasons from the general to specific, is inductive:

It has snowed in Massachusetts every December in recorded history.
Therefore, it will snow in Massachusetts this coming December.

It is worth noting that the proof technique used in mathematics called "mathematical induction", is deductive and not inductive. Proofs that make use of mathematical induction typically take the following form:

Property P is true of the number 0.
For all natural numbers n, if P holds of n then P also holds of n + 1.
Therefore, P is true of all natural numbers.

When such a proof is given by a mathematician, it is thought that if the premises are true, then the conclusion follows necessarily. Therefore, such an argument is deductive by contemporary standards.

Because the difference between inductive and deductive arguments involves the strength of evidence which the author believes the premises to provide for the conclusion, inductive and deductive arguments differ with regard to the standards of evaluation that are applicable to them. The difference does not have to do with the content or subject matter of the argument. Indeed, the same utterance may be used to present either a deductive or an inductive argument, depening on the intentions of the person advancing it. Consider as an example.

Dom Perignon is a champagne, so it must be made in France.

It might be clear from context that the speaker believes that having been made in the Champagne area of France is part of the defining feature of "champagne" and so the conclusion follows from the premise by definition. If it is the intention of the speaker that the evidence is of this sort, then the argument is deductive. However, it may be that no such thought is in the speaker's mind. He or she may merely believe that nearly all champagne is made in France, and may be reasoning probabilistically. If this is his or her intention, then the argument is inductive.

It is also worth noting that, at its core, the distinction between deductive and inductive  has to do with the strength of the justification that the author or expositor of the argument intends that the premises provide for the conclusion. If the argument is logically fallacious, it may be that the premises actually do not provide justification of that strength, or even any justification at all. Consider, the following argument:

All odd numbers are integers.
All even numbers are integers.
Therefore, all odd numbers are even numbers.

This argument is logically fallacious because it is invalid. In actuality, the premises provide no support whatever for the conclusion. However, if this argument were ever seriously advanced, we must assume that the author would believe that the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion. Therefore, this argument is still deductive. A bad deductive argument is not an inductive argument.

See also the articles on "Argument" and "Validity and Soundness" in this encyclopedia.

Author Information

IEP Staff

The Philosophy of Anthropology

The Philosophy of Anthropology refers to the central philosophical perspectives which underpin, or have underpinned, the dominant schools in anthropological thinking. It is distinct from Philosophical Anthropology which attempts to define and understand what it means to be human.

This article provides an overview of the most salient anthropological schools, the philosophies which underpin them and the philosophical debates surrounding these schools within anthropology. It specifically operates within these limits because the broader discussions surrounding the Philosophy of Science and the Philosophy of Social Science  have been dealt with at length elsewhere in this encyclopedia. Moreover, the specific philosophical perspectives have also been discussed in great depth in other contributions, so they will be elucidated to the extent that this is useful to comprehending their relationship with anthropology. In examining the Philosophy of Anthropology, it is necessary to draw some, even if cautious borders, between anthropology and other disciplines. Accordingly, in drawing upon anthropological discussions, we will define, as anthropologists, scholars who identify as such and who publish in anthropological journals and the like. In addition, early anthropologists will be selected by virtue of their interest in peasant culture and non-Western, non-capitalist and stateless forms of human organization.

The article specifically aims to summarize the philosophies underpinning anthropology, focusing on the way in which anthropology has drawn upon them. The philosophies themselves have been dealt with in depth elsewhere in this encyclopedia. It has been suggested by philosophers of social science that anthropology tends to reflect, at any one time, the dominant intellectual philosophy because, unlike in the physical sciences, it is influenced by qualitative methods and so can more easily become influenced by ideology (for example Kuznar 1997 or Andreski 1974). This article begins by examining what is commonly termed ‘physical anthropology.’ This is the science-oriented form of anthropology which came to prominence in the nineteenth century. As part of this section, the article also examines early positivist social anthropology, the historical relationship between anthropology and eugenics, and the philosophy underpinning this.

The next section examines naturalistic anthropology. ‘Naturalism,’ in this usage, is drawn from the biological ‘naturalists’ who collected specimens in nature and described them in depth, in contrast to ‘experimentalists.’ Anthropological ‘naturalists’ thus conduct fieldwork with groups of people rather than engage in more experimental methods. The naturalism section looks at the philosophy underpinning the development of ethnography-focused anthropology, including cultural determinism, cultural relativism, fieldwork ethics and the many criticisms which this kind of anthropology has provoked. Differences in its development in Western and Eastern Europe also are analyzed. As part of this, the article discusses the most influential schools within naturalistic anthropology and their philosophical foundations.

The article then examines Post-Modern or ‘Contemporary’ anthropology. This school grew out of the ‘Crisis of Representation’ in anthropology beginning in the 1970s. The article looks at how the Post-Modern critique has been applied to anthropology, and it examines the philosophical assumptions behind developments such as auto-ethnography. Finally, it examines the view that there is a growing philosophical split within the discipline.

Table of Contents

  1. Positivist Anthropology
    1. Physical Anthropology
    2. Race and Eugenics in Nineteenth Century Anthropology
    3. Early Evolutionary Social Anthropology
  2. Naturalist Anthropology
    1. The Eastern European School
    2. The Ethnographic School
    3. Ethics and Participant Observation Fieldwork
  3. Anthropology since World War I
    1. Cultural Determinism and Cultural Relativism
    2. Functionalism and Structuralism
    3. Post-Modern or Contemporary Anthropology
  4. Philosophical Dividing Lines
    1. Contemporary Evolutionary Anthropology
    2. Anthropology: A Philosophical Split?
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Positivist Anthropology

a. Physical Anthropology

Anthropology itself began to develop as a separate discipline in the mid-nineteenth century, as Charles Darwin’s (1809-1882) Theory of Evolution by Natural Selection (Darwin 1859) became widely accepted among scientists. Early anthropologists attempted to apply evolutionary theory within the human species, focusing on physical differences between different human sub-species or racial groups (see Eriksen 2001) and the perceived intellectual differences that followed.

The philosophical assumptions of these anthropologists were, to a great extent, the same assumptions which have been argued to underpin science itself. This is the positivism, rooted in Empiricism, which argued that knowledge could only be reached through the empirical method and statements were meaningful only if they could be empirically justified, though it should be noted that Darwin should not necessarily be termed a positivist. Science needed to be solely empirical, systematic and exploratory, logical, theoretical (and thus focused on answering questions). It needed to attempt to make predictions which are open to testing and falsification and it needed to be epistemologically optimistic (assuming that the world can be understood). Equally, positivism argues that truth-statements are value-neutral, something disputed by the postmodern school. Philosophers of Science, such as Karl Popper (1902-1994) (for example Popper 1963), have also stressed that science must be self-critical, prepared to abandon long-held models as new information arises, and thus characterized by falsification rather than verification though this point was also earlier suggested by Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) (for example Spencer 1873). Nevertheless, the philosophy of early physical anthropologists included a belief in empiricism, the fundamentals of logic and epistemological optimism. This philosophy has been criticized by anthropologists such as Risjord (2007) who has argued that it is not self-aware – because values, he claims, are always involved in science – and non-neutral scholarship can be useful in science because it forces scientists to better contemplate their ideas.

b. Race and Eugenics in Nineteenth Century Anthropology

During the mid-nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, anthropologists began to systematically examine the issue of racial differences, something which became even more researched after the acceptance of evolutionary theory (see Darwin 1871). That said, it should be noted that Darwin himself did not specifically advocate eugenics or theories of progress. However, even prior to Darwin’s presentation of evolution (Darwin 1859), scholars were already attempting to understand 'races' and the evolution of societies from ‘primitive’ to complex (for example Tylor 1865).

Early anthropologists such as Englishman John Beddoe (1826-1911) (Boddoe 1862) or Frenchman Arthur de Gobineau (1816-1882) (Gobineau 1915) developed and systematized racial taxonomies which divided, for example, between ‘black,’ ‘yellow’ and ‘white.’ For these anthropologists, societies were reflections of their racial inheritance; a viewpoint termed biological determinism. The concept of ‘race’ has been criticized, within anthropology, variously, as being simplistic and as not being a predictive (and thus not a scientific) category (for example Montagu 1945) and there was already some criticism of the scope of its predictive validity in the mid-nineteenth century (for example Pike 1869). The concept has also been criticized on ethical grounds, because racial analysis is seen to promote racial violence and discrimination and uphold a certain hierarchy, and some have suggested its rejection because of its connotations with such regimes as National Socialism or Apartheid, meaning that it is not a neutral category (for example Wilson 2002, 229).

Those anthropologists who continue to employ the category have argued that ‘race’ is predictive in terms of life history, only involves the same inherent problems as any cautiously essentialist taxonomy and that moral arguments are irrelevant to the scientific usefulness of a category of apprehension (for example Pearson 1991) but, to a great extent, current anthropologists reject racial categorization. The American Anthropological Association’s (1998) ‘Statement on Race’ began by asserting that: ‘"Race" thus evolved as a worldview, a body of prejudgments that distorts our ideas about human differences and group behavior. Racial beliefs constitute myths about the diversity in the human species and about the abilities and behavior of people homogenized into "racial" categories.’ In addition, a 1985 survey by the American Anthropological Association found that only a third of cultural anthropologists (but 59 percent of physical anthropologists) regarded ‘race’ as a meaningful category (Lynn 2006, 15). Accordingly, there is general agreement amongst anthropologists that the idea, promoted by anthropologists such as Beddoe, that there is a racial hierarchy, with the white race as superior to others, involves importing the old ‘Great Chain of Being’ (see Lovejoy 1936) into scientific analysis and should be rejected as unscientific, as should ‘race’ itself. In terms of philosophy, some aspects of nineteenth century racial anthropology might be seen to reflect the theories of progress that developed in the nineteenth century, such as those of G. W. F. Hegel (1770-1831) (see below). In addition, though we will argue that Herderian nationalism is more influential in Eastern Europe, we should not regard it as having no influence at all in British anthropology. Native peasant culture, the staple of the Eastern European, Romantic nationalism-influenced school (as we will see), was studied in nineteenth century Britain, especially in Scotland and Wales, though it was specifically classified as ‘folklore’ and as outside anthropology (see Rogan 2012). However, as we will discuss, the influence is stronger in Eastern Europe.

The interest in race in anthropology developed alongside a broader interest in heredity and eugenics. Influenced by positivism, scholars such as Herbert Spencer (1873) applied evolutionary theory as a means of understanding differences between different societies. Spencer was also seemingly influenced, on some level, by theories of progress of the kind advocated by Hegel and even found in Christian theology. For him, evolution logically led to eugenics. Spencer argued that evolution involved a progression through stages of ever increasing complexity – from lower forms to higher forms - to an end-point at which humanity was highly advanced and was in a state of equilibrium with nature. For this perfected humanity to be reached, humans needed to engage in self-improvement through selective breeding.

American anthropologist Madison Grant (1865-1937) (Grant 1916), for example, reflected a significant anthropological view in 1916 when he argued that humans, and therefore human societies, were essentially reflections of their biological inheritance and that environmental differences had almost no impact on societal differences. Grant, as with other influential anthropologists of the time, advocated a program of eugenics in order to improve the human stock. According to this program, efforts would be made to encourage breeding among the supposedly superior races and social classes and to discourage it amongst the inferior races and classes (see also Galton 1909). This form of anthropology has been criticized for having a motivation other than the pursuit of truth, which has been argued to be the only appropriate motivation for any scientist. It has also been criticized for basing its arguments on disputed system of categories – race – and for uncritically holding certain assumptions about what is good for humanity (for example Kuznar 1997, 101-109). It should be emphasized that though eugenics was widely accepted among anthropologists in the nineteenth century, there were also those who criticized it and its assumptions (for example Boas 1907. See Stocking 1991 for a detailed discussion). Proponents have countered that a scientist’s motivations are irrelevant as long as his or her research is scientific, that race should not be a controversial category from a philosophical perspective and that it is for the good of science itself that the more scientifically-minded are encouraged to breed (for example Cattell 1972). As noted, some scholars stress the utility of ideologically-based scholarship.

A further criticism of eugenics is that it fails to recognize the supposed inherent worth of all individual humans (for example Pichot 2009). Advocates of eugenics, such as Grant (1916), dismiss this as a ‘sentimental’ dogma which fails to accept that humans are animals, as acceptance of evolutionary theory, it is argued, obliges people to accept, and which would lead to the decline of civilization and science itself. We will note possible problems with this perspective in our discussion of ethics. Also, it might be useful to mention that the form of anthropology that is sympathetic to eugenics is today centered around an academic journal called The Mankind Quarterly, which critics regard as ‘racist’ (for example Tucker 2002, 2) and even academically biased (for example Ehrenfels 1962). Although ostensibly an anthropology journal, it also publishes psychological research. A prominent example of such an anthropologist is Roger Pearson (b. 1927), the journal’s current editor. But such a perspective is highly marginal in current anthropology.

c. Early Evolutionary Social Anthropology

Also from the middle of the nineteenth century, there developed a school in Western European and North American anthropology which focused less on race and eugenics and more on answering questions relating to human institutions, and how they evolved, such as ‘How did religion develop?’ or ‘How did marriage develop?’ This school was known as ‘cultural evolutionism.’ Members of this school, such as Sir James Frazer (1854-1941) (Frazer 1922), were influenced by the positivist view that science was the best model for answering questions about social life. They also shared with other evolutionists an acceptance of a modal human nature which reflected evolution to a specific environment. However, some, such as E. B. Tylor (1832-1917) (Tylor 1871), argued that human nature was the same everywhere, moving away from the focus on human intellectual differences according to race. The early evolutionists believed that as surviving ‘primitive’ social organizations, within European Empires for example, were examples of the ‘primitive Man,’ the nature of humanity, and the origins of its institutions, could be best understood through analysis of these various social groups and their relationship with more ‘civilized’ societies (see Gellner 1995, Ch. 2).

As with the biological naturalists, scholars such as Frazer and Tylor collected specimens on these groups – in the form of missionary descriptions of ‘tribal life’ or descriptions of 'tribal life' by Westernized tribal members – and compared them to accounts of more advanced cultures in order to answer discrete questions. Using this method of accruing sources, now termed ‘armchair anthropology’ by its critics, the early evolutionists attempted to answered discrete questions about the origins and evolution of societal institutions. As early sociologist Emile Durkheim (1858-1917) (Durkheim 1965) summarized it, such scholars aimed to discover ‘social facts.’ For example, Frazer concluded, based on sources, that societies evolved from being dominated by a belief in Magic, to a belief in Spirits and then a belief in gods and ultimately one God. For Tylor, religion began with ‘animism’ and evolved into more complex forms but tribal animism was the essence of religion and it had developed in order to aid human survival.

This school of anthropology has been criticized because of its perceived inclination towards reductionism (such as defining ‘religion’ purely as ‘survival’), its speculative nature and its failure to appreciate the problems inherent in relying on sources, such as ‘gate keepers’ who will present their group in the light in which they want it to be seen. Defenders have countered that without attempting to understand the evolution of societies, social anthropology has no scientific aim and can turn into a political project or simply description of perceived oddities (for example Hallpike 1986, 13). Moreover, the kind of stage theories advocated by Tylor have been criticized for conflating evolution with historicist theories of progress, by arguing that societies always pass through certain phases of belief and the Western civilization is the pinnacle of development, a belief known as unilinealism. This latter point has been criticized as ethnocentric (for example Eriksen 2001) and reflects some of the thinking of Herbert Spencer, who was influential in early British anthropology.

2. Naturalist Anthropology

a. The Eastern European School

Whereas Western European and North American anthropology were oriented towards studying the peoples within the Empires run by the Western powers and was influenced by Darwinian science, Eastern European anthropology developed among nascent Eastern European nations. This form of anthropology was strongly influenced by Herderian nationalism and ultimately by Hegelian political philosophy and the Romantic Movement of eighteenth century philosopher Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778). Eastern European anthropologists believed, following the Romantic Movement, that industrial or bourgeois society was corrupt and sterile. The truly noble life was found in the simplicity and naturalness of communities close to nature. The most natural form of community was a nation of people, bonded together by shared history, blood and customs, and the most authentic form of such a nation’s lifestyle was to be found amongst its peasants. Accordingly, Eastern European anthropology elevated peasant life as the most natural form of life, a form of life that should, on some level, be strived towards in developing the new ‘nation’ (see Gellner 1995).

Eastern European anthropologists, many of them motivated by Romantic nationalism, focused on studying their own nations’ peasant culture and folklore in order to preserve it and because the nation was regarded as unique and studying its most authentic manifestation was therefore seen as a good in itself. As such, Eastern European anthropologists engaged in fieldwork amongst the peasants, observing and documenting their lives. There is a degree to which the kind of anthropology – or ‘ethnology’ – remains more popular in Eastern than in Western Europe (see, for example, Ciubrinskas 2007 or SarkanyND) at the time of writing.

Siikala (2006) observes that Finnish anthropology is now moving towards the Western model of fieldwork abroad but as recently as the 1970s was still predominantly the study of folklore and peasant culture. Baranski (2009) notes that in Poland, Polish anthropologists who wish to study international topics still tend to go to the international centers while those who remain in Poland tend to focus on Polish folk culture, though the situation is slowly changing. Lithuanian anthropologist Vytis Ciubrinkas (2007) notes that throughout Eastern Europe, there is very little separate ‘anthropology,’ with the focus being ‘national ethnology’ and ‘folklore studies,’ almost always published in the vernacular. But, again, he observes that the kind of anthropology popular in Western Europe is making inroads into Eastern Europe. In Russia, national ethnology and peasant culture also tends to be predominant (for example Baiburin 2005). Indeed, even beyond Eastern Europe, it was noted in the year 2000 that ‘the emphasis of Indian social anthropologists remains largely on Indian tribes and peasants. But the irony is that barring the detailed tribal monographs prepared by the British colonial officers and others (. . .) before Independence, we do not have any recent good ethnographies of a comparable type’ (Srivastava 2000). By contrast, Japanese social anthropology has traditionally been in the Western model, studying cultures more ‘primitive’ than its own (such as Chinese communities), at least in the nineteenth century. Only later did it start to focus more on Japanese folk culture and it is now moving back towards a Western model (see Sedgwick 2006, 67).

The Eastern school has been criticized for uncritically placing a set of dogmas – specifically nationalism – above the pursuit of truth, accepting a form of historicism with regard to the unfolding of the nation’s history and drawing a sharp, essentialist line around the nationalist period of history (for example Popper 1957). Its anthropological method has been criticized because, it is suggested, Eastern European anthropologists suffer from home blindness. By virtue of having been raised in the culture which they are studying, they cannot see it objectively and penetrate to its ontological presuppositions (for example Kapferer 2001).

b. The Ethnographic School

The Ethnographic school, which has since come to characterize social and cultural anthropology, was developed by Polish anthropologist Bronislaw Malinowski (1884-1942) (for example Malinowski 1922). Originally trained in Poland, Malinowski’s anthropological philosophy brought together key aspects of the Eastern and Western schools. He argued that, as with the Western European school, anthropologists should study foreign societies. This avoided home blindness and allowed them to better perceive these societies objectively. However, as with the Eastern European School, he argued that anthropologists should observe these societies in person, something termed ‘participant observation’ or ‘ethnography.’ This method, he argued, solved many of the problems inherent in armchair anthropology.

It is this method which anthropologists generally summarize as ‘naturalism’ in contrast to the ‘positivism,’ usually followed alongside a quantitative method, of evolutionary anthropologists. Naturalist anthropologists argue that their method is ‘scientific’ in the sense that it is based on empirical observation but they argue that some kinds of information cannot be obtained in laboratory conditions or through questionnaires, both of which lend themselves to quantitative, strictly scientific analysis. Human culturally-influenced actions differ from the subjects of physical science because they involve meaning within a system and meaning can only be discerned after long-term immersion in the culture in question. Naturalists therefore argue that a useful way to find out information about and understand a people – such as a tribe – is to live with them, observe their lives, gain their trust and eventually live, and even think, as they do. This latter aim, specifically highlighted by Malinowski, has been termed the empathetic perspective and is considered, by many naturalist anthropologists, to be a crucial sign of research that is anthropological. In addition to these ideas, the naturalist perspective draws upon aspects of the Romantic Movement in that it stresses, and elevates, the importance of ‘gaining empathy’ and respecting the group it is studying, some naturalists argue that there are ‘ways of knowing’ other than science (for example Rees 2010) and that respect for the group can be more important than gaining new knowledge. They also argue that human societies are so complex that they cannot simply be reduced to biological explanations.

In many ways, the successor to Malinowski as the most influential cultural anthropologist was the American Clifford Geertz (1926-2006). Where Malinowski emphasized ‘participant observation’ – and thus, to a greater degree, an outsider perspective – it was Geertz who argued that the successful anthropologist reaches a point where he sees things from the perspective of the native. The anthropologist should bring alive the native point of view, which Roth (1989) notes ‘privileges’ the native, thus challenging a hierarchical relationship between the observed and the observer. He thus strongly rejected a distinction which Malinowski is merely critical of: the distinction between a ‘primitive’ and ‘civilized’ culture. In many respects, this distinction was also criticised by the Structuralists – whose central figure, Claude Levi-Strauss (1908-2009), was an earlier generation than Geertz – as they argued that all human minds involved similar binary structures (see below).

However, there was a degree to which both Malinowski and Geertz did not divorce ‘culture’ from ‘biology.’ Malinowski (1922) argued that anthropological interpretations should ultimately be reducible to human instincts while Geertz (1973, 46-48) argued that culture can be reduced to biology and that culture also influences biology, though he felt that the main aim of the ethnographer was to interpret. Accordingly, it is not for the anthropologist to comment on the culture in terms of its success or the validity of its beliefs. The anthropologist’s purpose is merely to record and interpret.

The majority of those who practice this form of anthropology are interpretivists. They argue that the aim of anthropology is to understand the norms, values, symbols and processes of a society and, in particular, their ‘meaning’ – how they fit together. This lends itself to the more subjective methods of participant observation. Applying a positivist methodology to studying social groups is regarded as dangerous because scientific understanding is argued to lead to better controlling the world and, in this case, controlling people. Interpretivist anthropology has been criticized, variously, as being indebted to imperialism (see below) and as too subjective and unscientific, because, unless there is a common set of analytical standards (such as an acceptance of the scientific method, at least to some extent), there is no reason to accept one subjective interpretation over another. This criticism has, in particular, been leveled against naturalists who accept cultural relativism (see below).

Also, many naturalist anthropologists emphasize the separateness of ‘culture’ from ‘biology,’ arguing that culture cannot simply be traced back to biology but rather is, to a great extent, independent of it; a separate category. For example, Risjord (2000) argues that anthropology ‘will never reach the social reality at which it aims’ precisely because ‘culture’ cannot simply be reduced to a series of scientific explanations. But it has been argued that if the findings of naturalist anthropology are not ultimately consilient with science then they are not useful to people outside of naturalist anthropology and that naturalist anthropology draws too stark a line between apes and humans when it claims that human societies are too complex to be reduced to biology or that culture is not closely reflective of biology (Wilson 1998, Ch. 1). In this regard, Bidney (1953, 65) argues that, ‘Theories of culture must explain the origins of culture and its intrinsic relations to the psychobiological nature of man’ as to fail to do so simply leaves the origin of culture as a ‘mystery or an accident of time.’

c. Ethics and Participant Observation Fieldwork

From the 1970s, the various leading anthropological associations began to develop codes of ethics. This was, at least in part, inspired by the perceived collaboration of anthropologists with the US-led counterinsurgency groups in South American states. For example, in the 1960s, Project Camelot commissioned anthropologists to look into the causes of insurgency and revolution in South American States, with a view to confronting these perceived problems. It was also inspired by the way that increasing numbers of anthropologists were employed outside of universities, in the private sector (see Sluka 2007).

The leading anthropological bodies – such as the Royal Anthropological Institute – hold to a system of research ethics which anthropologists, conducting fieldwork, are expected, though not obliged, to adhere to. For example, the most recent American Anthropological Association Code of Ethics (1998) emphasizes that certain ethical obligations can supersede the goal of seeking new knowledge. Anthropologists, for example, may not publish research which may harm the ‘safety,’ ‘privacy’ or ‘dignity’ of those whom they study, they must explain their fieldwork to their subjects and emphasise that attempts at anonymity may sometimes fail, they should find ways of reciprocating to those whom they study and they should preserve opportunities for future fieldworkers.

Though the American Anthropological Association does not make their philosophy explicit, much of the philosophy appears to be underpinned by the golden rule. One should treat others as one would wish to be treated oneself. In this regard, one would not wish to be exploited, misled or have ones safety or privacy comprised. For some scientists, the problem with such a philosophy is that, from their perspective, humans should be an objective object of study like any other. The assertion that the ‘dignity’ of the individual should be preserved may be seen to reflect a humanist belief in the inherent worth of each human being. Humanism has been accused of being sentimental and of failing to appreciate the substantial differences between human beings intellectually, with some anthropologists even questioning the usefulness of the broad category ‘human’ (for example Grant 1916). It has also been accused of failing to appreciate that, from a scientific perspective, humans are a highly evolved form of ape and scholars who study them should attempt to think, as Wilson (1975, 575) argues, as if they are alien zoologists. Equally, it has been asked why primary ethical responsibility should be to those studied. Why should it not be to the public or the funding body? (see Sluka 2007) In this regard, it might be suggested that the code reflects the lauding of members of (often non-Western) cultures which might ultimately be traced back to the Romantic Movement. Their rights are more important than those of the funders, the public or of other anthropologists.

Equally, the code has been criticized in terms of power dynamics, with critics arguing that the anthropologist is usually in a dominant position over those being studied which renders questionable the whole idea of ‘informed consent’ (Bourgois 2007). Indeed, it has been argued that the most recent American Anthropological Association Code of Ethics (1998) is a movement to the right, in political terms, because it accepts, explicitly, that responsibility should also be to the public and to funding bodies and is less censorious than previous codes with regard to covert research (Pels 1999). This seems to be a movement towards a situation where a commitment to the group being studied is less important than the pursuit of truth, though the commitment to the subject of study is still clear.

Likewise, the most recent set of ethical guidelines from the Association of Anthropologists of the UK and the Commonwealth implicitly accepts that there is a difference of opinion among anthropologists regarding whom they are obliged to. It asserts, ‘Most anthropologists would maintain that their paramount obligation is to their research participants . . .’ This document specifically warrants against giving subjects ‘self-knowledge which they did not seek or want.’ This may be seen to reflect a belief in a form of cultural relativism. Permitting people to preserve their way of thinking is more important than their knowing what a scientist would regard as the truth. Their way of thinking – a part of their culture - should be respected, because it is theirs, even if it is inaccurate. This could conceivably prevent anthropologists from publishing dissections of particular cultures if they might be read by members of that culture (see Dutton 2009, Ch. 2). Thus, philosophically, the debate in fieldwork ethics ranges from a form of consequentialism to, in the form of humanism, a deontological form of ethics. However, it should be emphasized that the standard fieldwork ethics noted are very widely accepted amongst anthropologists, particularly with regard to informed consent. Thus, the idea of experimenting on unwilling or unknowing humans is strongly rejected, which might be interpreted to imply some belief in human separateness.

3. Anthropology since World War I

a. Cultural Determinism and Cultural Relativism

As already discussed, Western European anthropology, around the time of World War I, was influenced by eugenics and biological determinism. But as early as the 1880s, this was beginning to be questioned by German-American anthropologist Franz Boas (1858-1942) (for example Boas 1907), based at Columbia University in New York. He was critical of biological determinism and argued for the importance of environmental influence on individual personality and thus modal national personality in a way of thinking called ‘historical particularism.’

Boas emphasized the importance of environment and history in shaping different cultures, arguing that all humans were biologically relatively similar and rejecting distinctions of ‘primitive’ and civilized.’ Boas also presented critiques of the work of early evolutionists, such as Tylor, demonstrating that not all societies passed through the phases he suggested or did not do so in the order he suggested. Boas used these findings to stress the importance of understanding societies individually in terms of their history and culture (for example Freeman 1983).

Boas sent his student Margaret Mead (1901-1978) to American Samoa to study the people there with the aim of proving that they were a ‘negative instance’ in terms of violence and teenage angst. If this could be proven, it would undermine biological determinism and demonstrate that people were in fact culturally determined and that biology had very little influence on personality, something argued by John Locke (1632-1704) and his concept of the tabula rasa. This would in turn mean that Western people’s supposed teenage angst could be changed through changing the culture. After six months in American Samoa, Mead returned to the USA and published, in 1928, her influential book Coming of Age in Samoa: A Psychological Study of Primitive Youth for Western Civilization (Mead 1928). It portrayed Samoa as a society of sexual liberty in which there were none of the problems associated with puberty that were associated with Western civilization. Accordingly, Mead argued that she had found a negative instance and that humans were overwhelming culturally determined. At around the same time Ruth Benedict (1887-1948), also a student of Boas’s, published her research in which she argued that individuals simply reflected the ‘culture’ in which they were raised (Benedict 1934).

The cultural determinism advocated by Boas, Benedict and especially Mead became very popular and developed into school which has been termed ‘Multiculturalism’ (Gottfried 2004). This school can be compared to Romantic nationalism in the sense that it regards all cultures as unique developments which should be preserved and thus advocates a form of ‘cultural relativism’ in which cultures cannot be judged by the standards of other cultures and can only be comprehended in their own terms. However, it should be noted that ‘cultural relativism’ is sometimes used to refer to the way in which the parts of a whole form a kind of separate organism, though this is usually referred to as ‘Functionalism.' In addition, Harris (see Headland, Pike, and Harris 1990) distinguishes between ‘emic’ (insider) and ‘etic’ (outsider) understanding of a social group, arguing that both perspectives seem to make sense from the different viewpoints. This might also be understood as cultural relativism and perhaps raises the question of whether the two worlds can so easily be separated.  Cultural relativism also argues, as with Romantic Nationalism, that so-called developed cultures can learn a great deal from that which they might regard as ‘primitive’ cultures. Moreover, humans are regarded as, in essence, products of culture and as extremely similar in terms of biology.

Cultural Relativism led to so-called ‘cultural anthropologists’ focusing on the symbols within a culture rather than comparing the different structures and functions of different social groups, as occurred in ‘social anthropology’ (see below). As comparison was frowned upon, as each culture was regarded as unique, anthropology in the tradition of Mead tended to focus on descriptions of a group’s way of life. Thick description is a trait of ethnography more broadly but it is especially salient amongst anthropologists who believe that cultures can only be understood in their own terms. Such a philosophy has been criticized for turning anthropology into little more than academic-sounding travel writing because it renders it highly personal and lacking in comparative analysis (see Sandall 2001, Ch. 1).

Cultural relativism has also been criticized as philosophically impractical and, ultimately, epistemologically pessimistic (Scruton 2000), because it means that nothing can be compared to anything else or even assessed through the medium of a foreign language’s categories. In implicitly defending cultural relativism, anthropologists have cautioned against assuming that some cultures are more ‘rational’ than others. Hollis (1967), for example, argues that anthropology demonstrates that superficially irrational actions may become ‘rational’ once the ethnographer understands the ‘culture.’ Risjord (2000) makes a similar point. This implies that the cultures are separate worlds, ‘rational’ in themselves. Others have suggested that entering the field assuming that the Western, ‘rational’ way of thinking is correct can lead to biased fieldwork interpretation (for example Rees 2010).

Critics have argued that certain forms of behaviour can be regarded as undesirable in all cultures, yet are only prevalent in some. It has also been argued that Multiculturalism is a form of Neo-Marxism on the grounds that it assumes imperialism and Western civilization to be inherently problematic but also because it lauds the materially unsuccessful. Whereas Marxism extols the values and lifestyle of the worker, and critiques that of the wealthy, Multiculturalism promotes “materially unsuccessful” cultures and critiques more materially successful, Western cultures (for example Ellis 2004 or Gottfried 2004).

Cultural determinism has been criticized both from within and from outside anthropology. From within anthropology, New Zealand anthropologist Derek Freeman (1916-2001), having been heavily influenced by Margaret Mead, conducted his own fieldwork in Samoa around twenty years after she did and then in subsequent fieldwork visits. As he stayed there far longer than Mead, Freeman was accepted to a greater extent and given an honorary chiefly title. This allowed him considerable access to Samoan life. Eventually, in 1983 (after Mead’s death) he published his refutation: Margaret Mead and Samoa: The Making and Unmaking of an Anthropological Myth (Freeman 1983). In it, he argued that Mead was completely mistaken. Samoa was sexually puritanical, violent and teenagers experienced just as much angst as they did everywhere else. In addition, he highlighted serious faults with her fieldwork: her sample was very small, she chose to live at the American naval base rather than with a Samoan family, she did not speak Samoan well, she focused mainly on teenage girls and Freeman even tracked one down who, as an elderly lady, admitted she and her friends had deliberately lied to Mead about their sex lives for their own amusement (Freeman 1999). It should be emphasized that Freeman’s critique of Mead related to her failure to conduct participant observation fieldwork properly (in line with Malinowski’s recommendations). In that Freeman rejects distinctions of primitive and advanced, and stresses the importance of culture in understanding human differences, it is also in the tradition of Boas. However, it should be noted that Freeman’s (1983) critique of Mead has also been criticized as being unnecessarily cutting, prosecuting a case against Mead to the point of bias against her and ignoring points which Mead got right (Schankman 2009, 17).

There remains an ongoing debate about the extent to which culture reflects biology or is on a biological leash. However, a growing body of research in genetics is indicating that human personality is heavily influenced by genetic factors (for example Alarcon, Foulks, and Vakkur 1998 or Wilson 1998), though some research also indicates that environment, especially while a fetus, can alter the expression of genes (see Nettle 2007). This has become part of the critique of cultural determinism from evolutionary anthropologists.

b. Functionalism and Structuralism

Between the 1930s and 1970s, various forms of functionalism were influential in British social anthropology. These schools accepted, to varying degrees, the cultural determinist belief that ‘culture’ was a separate sphere from biology and operated according to its own rules but they also argued that social institutions could be compared in order to better discern the rules of such institutions. They attempted to discern and describe how cultures operated and how the different parts of a culture functioned within the whole. Perceiving societies as organisms has been traced back to Herbert Spencer. Indeed, there is a degree to which Durkheim (1965) attempted to understand, for example, the function of religion in society. But functionalism seemingly reflected aspects of positivism: the search for, in this case, social facts (cross-culturally true), based on empirical evidence.

E. E. Evans-Pritchard (1902-1973) was a leading British functionalist from the 1930s onwards. Rejecting grand theories of religion, he argued that a tribe’s religion could only make sense in terms of function within society and therefore a detailed understanding of the tribe’s history and context was necessary. British functionalism, in this respect, was influenced by the linguistic theories of Swiss thinker Ferdinand de Saussure (1857-1913), who suggested that signs only made sense within a system of signs. He also engaged in lengthy fieldwork. This school developed into ‘structural functionalism.’ A. R. Radcliffe-Brown (1881-1955) is often argued to be a structural functionalist, though he denied this. Radcliffe-Brown rejected Malinowski’s functionalism – which argued that social practices were grounded in human instincts. Instead, he was influenced by the process philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947). Radcliffe-Brown claimed that the units of anthropology were processes of human life and interaction. They are in constant flux and so anthropology must explain social stability. He argued that practices, in order to survive, must adapt to other practices, something called ‘co-adaptation’ (Radcliffe-Brown 1957). It might be argued that this leads us asking where any of the practices came from in the first place.

However, a leading member of the structural functionalist school was Scottish anthropologist Victor Turner (1920-1983). Structural functionalists attempted to understand society as a structure with inter-related parts. In attempting to understand Rites of Passage, Turner argued that everyday structured society could be contrasted with the Rite of Passage (Turner 1969). This was a liminal (transitional) phase which involved communitas (a relative breakdown of structure). Another prominent anthropologist in this field was Mary Douglas (1921-2007). She examined the contrast between the ‘sacred’ and ‘profane’ in terms of categories of ‘purity’ and ‘impurity’ (Douglas 1966). She also suggested a model – the Grid/Group Model – through which the structures of different cultures could be categorized (Douglas 1970). Philosophically, this school accepted many of the assumptions of naturalism but it held to aspects of positivism in that it aimed to answer discrete questions, using the ethnographic method. It has been criticized, as we will see below, by postmodern anthropologists and also for its failure to attempt consilience with science.

Turner, Douglas and other anthropologists in this school, followed Malinowski by using categories drawn from the study of 'tribal' cultures – such as Rites of Passage, Shaman and Totem – to better comprehend advanced societies such as that of Britain. For example, Turner was highly influential in pursuing the Anthropology of Religion in which he used tribal categories as a means of comprehending aspects of the Catholic Church, such as modern-day pilgrimage (Turner and Turner 1978). This research also involved using the participant observation method. Critics, such as Romanian anthropologist Mircea Eliade (1907-1986) (for example Eliade 2004), have insisted that categories such as ‘shaman’ only make sense within their specific cultural context. Other critics have argued that such scholarship attempts to reduce all societies to the level of the local community despite there being many important differences and fails to take into account considerable differences in societal complexity (for example Sandall 2001, Ch. 1). Nevertheless, there is a growing movement within anthropology towards examining various aspects of human life through the so-called tribal prism and, more broadly, through the cultural one. Mary Douglas, for example, has looked at business life anthropologically while others have focused on politics, medicine or education. This has been termed ‘traditional empiricism’ by critics in contemporary anthropology (for example Davies 2010).

In France, in particular, the most prominent school, during this period, was known as Structuralism. Unlike British Functionalism, structuralism was influenced by Hegelian idealism.  Most associated with Claude Levi-Strauss, structuralism argued that all cultures follow the Hegelian dialectic. The human mind has a universal structure and a kind of a priori category system of opposites, a point which Hollis argues can be used as a starting point for any comparative cultural analysis. Cultures can be broken up into components – such as ‘Mythology’ or ‘Ritual’ – which evolve according to the dialectical process, leading to cultural differences. As such, the deep structures, or grammar, of each culture can be traced back to a shared starting point (and in a sense, the shared human mind) just as one can with a language. But each culture has a grammar and this allows them to be compared and permits insights to be made about them (see, for example, Levi-Strauss 1978). It might be suggested that the same criticisms that have been leveled against the Hegelian dialectic might be leveled against structuralism, such as it being based around a dogma. It has also been argued that category systems vary considerably between cultures (see Diamond 1974). Even supporters of Levi-Strauss have conceded that his works are opaque and verbose (for example Leach 1974).

c. Post-Modern or Contemporary Anthropology

The ‘postmodern’ thinking of scholars such as Jacques Derrida (1930-2004) and Michel Foucault (1926-1984) began to become influential in anthropology in the 1970s and have been termed anthropology’s ‘Crisis of Representation.’ During this crisis, which many anthropologists regard as ongoing, every aspect of ‘traditional empirical anthropology’ came to be questioned.

Hymes (1974) criticized anthropologists for imposing ‘Western categories’ – such as Western measurement – on those they study, arguing that this is a form of domination and was immoral, insisting that truth statements were always subjective and carried cultural values. Talal Asad (1971) criticized field-work based anthropology for ultimately being indebted to colonialism and suggested that anthropology has essentially been a project to enforce colonialism. Geertzian anthropology was criticized because it involved representing a culture, something which inherently involved imposing Western categories upon it through producing texts. Marcus argued that anthropology was ultimately composed of ‘texts’ – ethnographies – which can be deconstructed to reveal power dynamics, normally the dominant-culture anthropologist making sense of the oppressed object of study through means of his or her subjective cultural categories and presenting it to his or her culture (for example Marcus and Cushman 1982). By extension, as all texts – including scientific texts – could be deconstructed, they argued, that they can make no objective assertions. Roth (1989) specifically criticizes seeing anthropology as ‘texts’ arguing that it does not undermine the empirical validity of the observations involved or help to find the power structures.

Various anthropologists, such as Roy Wagner (b. 1938) (Wagner 1981), argued that anthropologists were simply products of Western culture and they could only ever hope to understand another culture through their own. There was no objective truth beyond culture, simply different cultures with some, scientific ones, happening to be dominant for various historical reasons. Thus, this school strongly advocated cultural relativism. Critics have countered that, after Malinowski, anthropologists, with their participant observation breaking down the color bar, were in fact an irritation to colonial authorities (for example Kuper 1973) and have criticized cultural relativism, as discussed.

This situation led to what has been called the ‘reflexive turn’ in cultural anthropology. As Western anthropologists were products of their culture, just as those whom they studied were, and as the anthropologist was himself fallible, there developed an increasing movement towards ‘auto-ethnography’ in which the anthropologist analyzed their own emotions and feelings towards their fieldwork. The essential argument for anthropologists engaging in detailed analysis of their own emotions, sometimes known as the reflexive turn, is anthropologist Charlotte Davies’ (1999, 6) argument that the ‘purpose of research is to mediate between different constructions of reality, and doing research means increasing understanding of these varying constructs, among which is included the anthropologist’s own constructions’ (see Curran 2010, 109). But implicit in Davies’ argument is that there is no such thing as objective reality and objective truth; there are simply different constructions of reality, as Wagner (1981) also argues. It has also been argued that autoethnography is ‘emancipatory’ because it turns anthropology into a dialogue rather than a traditional hierarchical analysis (Heaton-Shreshta 2010, 49). Auto-ethnography has been criticized as self-indulgent and based on problematic assumptions such as cultural relativism and the belief that morality is the most important dimension to scholarship (for example Gellner 1992). In addition, the same criticisms that have been leveled against postmodernism more broadly have been leveled against postmodern anthropology, including criticism of a sometimes verbose and emotive style and the belief that it is epistemologically pessimistic and therefore leads to a Void (for example Scruton 2000). However, cautious defenders insist on the importance of being at least ‘psychologically aware’ (for example Emmett 1976) before conducting fieldwork, a point also argued by Popper (1963) with regard to conducting any scientific research. And Berger (2010) argues that auto-ethnography can be useful to the extent that it elucidates how a ‘social fact’ was uncovered by the anthropologist.

One of the significant results of the ‘Crisis of Representation’ has been a cooling towards the concept of ‘culture’ (and indeed ‘culture shock’) which was previously central to ‘cultural anthropology’ (see Oberg 1960 or Dutton 2012). ‘Culture’ has been criticized as old-fashioned, boring, problematic because it possesses a history (Rees 2010), associated with racism because it has come to replace ‘race’ in far right politics (Wilson 2002, 229), problematic because it imposes (imperialistically) a Western category on other cultures, vague and difficult to perfectly define (Rees 2010), helping to maintain a hierarchy of cultures (Abu Lughod 1991) and increasingly questioned by globalization and the breakdown of discrete cultures (for example Eriksen 2002 or Rees 2010). Defenders of culture have countered that many of these criticisms can be leveled against any category of apprehension and that the term is not synonymous with ‘nation’ so can be employed even if nations become less relevant (for example Fox and King 2002). Equally, ‘culture shock,’ formerly used to describe a rite of passage amongst anthropologists engaging in fieldwork, has been criticized because of its association with culture and also as old-fashioned (Crapanzano 2010).

In addition, a number of further movements have been provoked by the postmodern movement in anthropology. One of these is ‘Sensory Ethnography’ (for example Pink 2009). It has been argued that traditionally anthropology privileges the Western emphasis on sight and the word and that ethnographies, in order to avoid this kind of cultural imposition, need to look at other senses such as smell, taste and touch. Another movement, specifically in the Anthropology of Religion, has argued that anthropologists should not go into the field as agnostics but should accept the possibility that the religious perspective of the group which they are studying may actually be correct and even work on the assumption that it is and engage in analysis accordingly (a point discussed in Engelke 2002).

During the same period, schools within anthropology developed based around a number of other fashionable philosophical ideologies. Feminist anthropology, like postmodern anthropology, began to come to prominence in the early 1970s. Philosophers such as Sandra Harding (1991) argued that anthropology had been dominated by men and this had led to anthropological interpretations being androcentric and a failure to appreciate the importance of women in social organizations. It has also led to androcentric metaphors in anthropological writing and focusing on research questions that mainly concern men. Strathern (1988) uses what she calls a Marxist-Feminist approach. She employs the categories of Melanesia in order to understand Melanesian gender relations to produce an ‘endogenous’ analysis of the situation. In doing so, she argues that actions in Melanesia are gender-neutral and the asymmetry between males and females is ‘action-specific.’ Thus, Melanesian women are not in any permanent state of social inferiority to men. In other words, if there is a sexual hierarchy it is de facto rather than de jure.

Critics have countered that prominent feminist interpretations have simply turned out to be empirically inaccurate. For example, feminist anthropologists, such as Weiner (1992) as well as philosopher Susan Dahlberg (1981), argued that foraging societies prized females and were peaceful and sexually egalitarian. It has been countered that this is a projection of feminist ideals which does not match with the facts (Kuznar 1997, Ch. 3). It has been argued that it does not follow that just because anthropology is male-dominated it is thus biased (Kuznar 1997, Ch. 3). However, feminist anthropologist Alison Wylie (see Risjord 1997) has argued that ‘politically motivated critiques’ including feminist ones, can improve science. Feminist critique, she argues, demonstrates the influence of ‘androcentric values’ on theory which forces scientists to hone their theories.

Another school, composed of some anthropologists from less developed countries or their descendants, have proffered a similar critique, shifting the feminist view that anthropology is androcentric by arguing that it is Euro-centric. It has been argued that anthropology is dominated by Europeans, and specifically Western Europeans and those of Western European descent, and therefore reflects European thinking and bias. For example, anthropologists from developing countries, such as Greenlandic Karla Jessen-Williamson, have argued that anthropology would benefit from the more holistic, intuitive thinking of non-Western cultures and that this should be integrated into anthropology (for example Jessen-Williamson 2006). American anthropologist Lee Baker (1991) describes himself as ‘Afro-Centric’ and argues that anthropology must be critiqued due to being based on a ‘Western’ and ‘positivistic’ tradition which is thus biased in favour of Europe. Afrocentric anthropology aims to shift this to an African (or African American) perspective. He argues that metaphors in anthropology, for example, are Euro-centric and justify the suppression of Africans. Thus, Afrocentric anthropologists wish to construct an ‘epistemology’ the foundations of which are African. The criticisms leveled against cultural relativism have been leveled with regard to such perspectives (see Levin 2005).

4. Philosophical Dividing Lines

a. Contemporary Evolutionary Anthropology

The positivist, empirical philosophy already discussed broadly underpins current evolutionary anthropology and there is an extent to which it, therefore, crosses over with biology. This is inline with the Consilience model, advocated by Harvard biologist Edward Wilson (b. 1929) (Wilson 1998), who has argued that the social sciences must attempt to be scientific, in order to share in the success of science, and, therefore, must be reducible to the science which underpins them. Contemporary evolutionary anthropologists, therefore, follow the scientific method, and often a quantitative methodology, to answer discrete questions and attempt to orient anthropological research within biology and the latest discoveries in this field. Also some scholars, such as Derek Freeman (1983), have defended a more qualitative methodology but, nevertheless, argued that their findings need to be ultimately underpinned by scientific research.

For example, anthropologist Pascal Boyer (2001) has attempted to understand the origins of ‘religion’ by drawing upon the latest research in genetics and in particular research into the functioning of the human mind. He has examined this alongside evidence from participant observation in an attempt to ‘explain’ religion. This subsection of evolutionary anthropology has been termed ‘Neuro-anthropology’ and attempts to better understand ‘culture’ through the latest discoveries in brain science. There are many other schools which apply different aspects of evolutionary theory – such as behavioral ecology, evolutionary genetics, paleontology and evolutionary psychology – to understanding cultural differences and different aspects of culture or subsections of culture such as ‘religion.’ Some scholars, such as Richard Dawkins (b. 1941) (Dawkins 1976), have attempted to render the study of culture more systematic by introducing the concept of cultural units – memes – and attempting to chart how and why certain memes are more successful than others, in light of research into the nature of the human brain.

Critics, in naturalist anthropology, have suggested that evolutionary anthropologists are insufficiently critical and go into the field thinking they already know the answers (for example Davies 2010). They have also argued that evolutionary anthropologists fail to appreciate that there are ways of knowing other than science. Some critics have also argued that evolutionary anthropology, with its acceptance of personality differences based on genetics, may lead to the maintenance of class and race hierarchies and to racism and discrimination (see Segerstråle 2000).

b. Anthropology: A Philosophical Split?

It has been argued both by scholars and journalists that anthropology, more so than other social scientific disciplines, is rent by a fundamental philosophical divide, though some anthropologists have disputed this and suggested that qualitative research can help to answer scientific research questions as long as naturalistic anthropologists accept the significance of biology.

The divide is trenchantly summarized by Lawson and McCauley (1993) who divide between ‘interpretivists’ and ‘scientists,’ or, as noted above, ‘positivists’ and ‘naturalists.’ For the scientists, the views of the ‘cultural anthropologists’ (as they call themselves) are too speculative, especially because pure ethnographic research is subjective, and are meaningless where they cannot be reduced to science. For the interpretivists, the ‘evolutionary anthropologists’ are too ‘reductionistic’ and ‘mechanistic,’ they do not appreciate the benefits of subjective approach (such as garnering information that could not otherwise be garnered), and they ignore questions of ‘meaning,’ as they suffer from ‘physics envy.’

Some anthropologists, such as Risjord (2000, 8), have criticized this divide arguing that two perspectives can be united and that only through ‘explanatory coherence’ (combining objective analysis of a group with the face-value beliefs of the group members) can a fully coherent explanation be reached. Otherwise, anthropology will ‘never reach the social reality at which it aims.’ But this seems to raise the question of what it means to ‘reach the social reality.’

In terms of physical action, the split has already been happening, as discussed in Segal and Yanagisako (2005, Ch. 1). They note that some American anthropological departments demand that their lecturers are committed to holist ‘four field anthropology’ (archaeology, cultural, biological and linguistic) precisely because of this ongoing split and in particular the divergence between biological and cultural anthropology. They observe that already by the end of the 1980s most biological anthropologists had left the American Anthropological Association. Though they argue that ‘holism’ was less necessary in Europe – because of the way that US anthropology, in focusing on Native Americans, ‘bundled’ the four - Fearn (2008) notes that there is a growing divide in British anthropology departments as well along the same dividing lines of positivism and naturalism.

Evolutionary anthropologists and, in particular, postmodern anthropologists do seem to follow philosophies with essentially different presuppositions. In November 2010, this divide became particularly contentious when the American Anthropological Association voted to remove the word ‘science’ from its Mission Statement (Berrett 2010).

5. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Edward Dutton
University of Oulu

Time Supplement

This supplement answers a series of questions designed to reveal more about what science requires of physical time, and to provide background information about other topics discussed in the Time article.

Table of Contents

  1. What are Instants and Durations?
  2. What is an Event?
  3. What is a Reference Frame?
  4. What is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What is Spacetime?
  6. What is a Minkowski Spacetime Diagram?
  7. What are the Metric and the Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Partly Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What is the Difference between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What Is Time Dilation?
  16. How does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox?
  19. What is the Solution to Zeno's Paradoxes?
  20. How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What does It Mean for a Clock to be Accurate?
  24. What is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better Than Others?

1. What Are Instants and Durations?

A duration is an amount of time. The duration of Earth's existence is about five billion years; the duration of a flash of lightning is 0.0002 seconds. The second is the standard unit for the measurement of duration [in the S.I. system (the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d'Unités)]. In informal conversation, an instant is a very short duration. In physics, however, an instant is instantaneous; it is not a very short duration but rather a point in time of zero duration. It is assumed in physics that a finite duration of a real event is always a linear continuum of the instants that compose the duration, but it is an interesting philosophical question to ask how physicists know this.

2. What Is an Event?

In ordinary discourse, an event is a happening lasting a finite duration during which some object changes its properties. For example, this morning’s event of buttering the toast is the toast’s changing from unbuttered to buttered. In ordinary discourse, unlike in physics, events are not basic, but rather are defined in terms of something more basic—objects and their properties. In physics it is the other way round. Events are basic, and objects are defined in terms of them.

The philosopher Jaegwon Kim suggested that an event is an object’s having a property at a time. So, two events are the same if they are both events of the same object having the same property at the same time. This suggestion makes it difficult to make sense of the remark, “The bombing of Pearl Harbor in World War II could have started an hour earlier.” On Kim’s analysis, the bombing could not have started earlier because, if it did, it would be a different event. A possible-worlds analysis of events might be the way to solve this problem, but the solution will not be explored here.

Physicists adopt the idealization that a basic event is a so-called point event: a property (value of a variable) at an instant of time and at a point in space. For example, there is the event of the gravitational field having the value g at place <x,y,z> at time t. In ordinary discourse an event must involve a change in some property; the physicist’s event does not have this requirement. A physicist’s basic event is called a “point event,” and, for the physicist, all other events are said to be composed of point events. The bombing of Pearl Harbor is a large set of point events.

A mathematical space is a collection of points, and the points might represent anything, for example, dollars. But the points of a real space, that is, a physical space, are locations. For example, the place called “New York City” at one time is composed of the actual point locations which occur within the city’s boundary at that time.

The physicists’ notion of point event is metaphysically unacceptable to many philosophers, in part because it deviates so much from the way “event” is used in ordinary language. In 1936, in order to avoid point events, Bertrand Russell and A. N. Whitehead developed a theory of time based on the assumption that all events in spacetime have a finite, non-zero duration. However, they had to assume that any finite part of an event is an event, and this assumption is no closer to common sense than the physicist’s assumption that all events are composed of point events. The encyclopedia article on Zeno’s Paradoxes mentions that Michael Dummett and Frank Arntzenius have continued in the 21st century to develop Russell’s and Whitehead’s idea that any event must have a non-zero duration.

McTaggart argued early in the twentieth century that events change. For example, the event of Queen Anne’s death is changing because it is receding ever farther into the past as time goes on. It is an open question in philosophy as to whether events change in this manner. Many other philosophers believe it is improper to consider an event to be something that can change. This is still an open question in philosophy.

For the physicist, it would be a mistake to say an event is an object’s having a property at a time and place. One needs to say an event is an object's having a property at a time and place in a specific reference frame. The bombing of Pearl Harbor lasts longer in some reference frames than others. The point is developed in the next section of this Supplement.

For a more detailed discussion of what an event is, see the article on Events.

3. What Is a Reference Frame?

A reference frame for a space is a standard point of view or a perspective for making observations, measurements and judgments about points in the space and phenomena that take place there. Usually a reference frame is specified by choosing a coordinate system.

Choosing a good reference frame can make a situation much easier to describe. If you are trying to describe the motion of a car down a straight highway, you would not want to choose a reference frame that is fixed to a spinning carousel. Instead, choose a reference frame fixed to the highway or else fixed to the car.

A reference frame is often specified by selecting a solid object that doesn’t change its size and by saying that the reference frame is fixed to the object. We might select a reference frame fixed to the Rock of Gibraltar. Another object is said to be at rest in the reference frame if it remains at a constant distance in a fixed direction from the Rock of Gibraltar. For example, your house is at rest in a reference frame fixed to the Rock of Gibraltar [not counting your house's vibrating when a truck drives by, nor the house's speed due to plate tectonics]. When we say the Sun rose this morning, we are implicitly choosing a reference frame fixed to the Earth’s surface. The Sun is not at rest in this reference frame, but the Earth is.

The reference frame or coordinate system must specify locations, and this is normally done by assigning numbers to points of space. In a flat (that is, Euclidean) three-dimensional space, the analyst who wants to assign a Cartesian (that is, flat or rectangular) coordinate system to the space will need to specify four distinct points on the reference body, or four objects mutually at rest somewhere in the frame. In a Cartesian coordinate system, one of the four points is the origin, and the other three can be used to define three independent, perpendicular axes, the familiar x, y and z directions. Two point objects are at the same place if they have the same x-value, the same y-value and the same z-value. To keep track of events rather than simply 3-d objects, you the analyst will need a time axis, a “t” axis, and so you will expand your three-dimensional mathematical space to a four-dimensional mathematical space. Two point events are identical if they occur at the same place and also at the same time. In this way, the analyst is placing a four-dimensional coordinate system on the space and time. The coordinates could have been letters instead of numbers, but real numbers are the best choice because we want to use them for measurement, not just for naming places and events.

For the physicist, in a reference frame, two basic events are simultaneous if a light beam from each will meet halfway between the locations of the two events in that frame. The assumption here is that the light beam hits no obstacles along the way. Similarly, the concept of earlier-than is frame relative. A moment, that is, a time, can be characterized as the set of all basic events which are simultaneous with one another (in a given reference frame). Moment x is considered to be earlier than moment y if all events constituting x are earlier than all events composing y. Given an event, there is no single time or moment at which it occurs; it can occur at one moment in one frame and at a different moment in another frame. We are now far from the intuitive idea of moment.

Physicists define a useful frame-independent notion of an event x being in the absolute past, as opposed to merely being in the past, of event y by saying this occurs if and only if (iff), in all frames of reference, x is earlier than y. What follows is that x is in the absolute past of y iff a light beam from x could have reached y. This is often expressed by saying x is in the absolute past of y iff x could have caused y but not vice versa.

This definition of “moment” presupposes relationalism. Also, it uses actual events rather than possible events, and it presupposes there are no empty moments, moments at which no event takes place. For any point of spacetime, perhaps it can be assumed that some event or other is always occurring there, such as its having a value for the gravitational field, or its having the property of not being part of a unicorn at that location and time.

The fact that physical spacetime has curvature implies that no single rigid (or Cartesian) coordinate system is capable of covering the entire spacetime. To cover all of spacetime in that case, we must make do with covering different regions of spacetime with different coordinate patches that are “knitted together” where one patch meets another. No single Cartesian coordinate system can cover the surface of a sphere without creating a singularity, but the sphere can be covered by patching together coordinate systems. Nevertheless if we can live with non-rigid curvilinear coordinates, then any curved spacetime can be covered with a global four-dimensional coordinate system in which every point being uniquely identified with a set of four numbers in a continuous way. That is, we use a curved coordinate system on curved spacetime.

A dimension is a direction in a space, and a coordinate is a number that serves as a location along a dimension. That we use four numbers per point usually indicates the space is four-dimensional. In creating reference frames for spaces, the usual assumption is that we should supply n independent numbers to specify a place in an n-dimensional space, where n is an integer. This is usual but not required; instead we could exploit the idea that there are space-filling curves which permit a single continuous curve to completely fill, and thus coordinatize, a region of dimension higher than one, such as a plane or a 3-dimensional space. For this reason (namely, that each point in n-dimensional space doesn’t always need n numbers to uniquely name the point), the contemporary definition of “dimension” is rather exotic.

Inertial frames are very special reference frames; see below.

4. What Is an Inertial Frame?

Special relativity is intended to apply only to inertial frames. Einstein's theory of special relativity is his 1905 theory of bodies that move in space and time. It is called "special" because it postulates the Lorentz-invariance of all physical law statements that hold in a special reference frames, called inertial frames. If we do not speak too precisely, we can say an inertial reference frame is a frame of reference in which Newton’s laws of motion are satisfied. That means that if you place a rock somewhere and don’t put any unbalanced external force on it, then the rock stays there forever; and if you give that rock a speed of 3 miles per hour, then from then on it will travel at 3 miles per hour until some force acts on it such as its hitting another rock. Our reality isn’t so simple; inertial reference frames do not exist and Newton's laws of motion are not true. However, for small volumes (rather than the whole universe) and short times (rather than eternity) there can be frames that are approximately inertial.

Suppose you've pre-selected your frame. How do you tell whether it is an inertial frame? The answer is that you check its laws of motion; you check that objects accelerate only when acted on by external forces. If no forces are present, then a moving object moves in a straight line. It doesn't curve; it coasts. And it travels equal distances in equal amounts of time.

Any frame of reference moving at constant velocity relative to an inertial frame is also an inertial frame. A reference frame spinning relative to an inertial frame is never an inertial frame.

According to the theory, the speed of light in a vacuum is the same when observed from any inertial frame of reference. Unlike the speed of a spaceship, the speed of light in a vacuum isn't affected by which inertial reference frame is used for the measurement. If you have two relatively stationary, synchronized clocks in an inertial frame, then they will read the same time, but if one moves relative to the other, then they will get out of synchrony. This loss of synchrony due to relative motion is called "time dilation."

The presence of gravitation normally destroys any possibility of finding a perfect inertial frame. Nevertheless, any spacetime obeying the general theory of relativity and thus accounting for gravitation will be locally Minkowskian in the sense that any infinitesimal region of spacetime has an inertial frame obeying the principles of special relativity.

5. What Is Spacetime?

Spacetime is where events are located, or, depending on your theory of spacetime, it can be said to be all possible events. Metaphysicians might say it is the mereological sum of those events. The dimensions of real spacetime include the time dimension of happens-after and (at least) the three ordinary space dimensions of, say, up-down, left-right, and forward-backward. That is, spacetime is usually represented with a four-dimensional mathematical space, one of whose dimensions represents time and three of whose dimensions represent space.

Spacetime is the intended model of the general theory of relativity. This requires it to be a differentiable space in which physical objects obey the equations of motion of the theory. Minkowski space (that is, Minkowski spacetime) is the model of special relativity. General relativity theory requires that spacetime be locally a Minkowski spacetime.

Hermann Minkowski, in 1908, was the first person to say that spacetime is fundamental and that space and time are just aspects of spacetime. Minkowski meant it is fundamental in the sense that the spacetime interval between any two events is intrinsic to spacetime and does not vary with the reference frame, unlike a distance or a duration between the two events.

Spacetime is believed to be a continuum in which we can define points and straight lines. However, these points and lines do not satisfy the principles of Euclidean geometry when gravity is present. Einstein showed that the presence of gravity affects geometry by warping space and time. Einstein's principal equation in his general theory of relativity implies that the curvature of spacetime is directly proportional to the density of mass in the spacetime. That is, Einstein says the structure of spacetime changes as matter moves because the gravitational field from matter actually curves spacetime. Black holes are a sign of radical curvature. The Earth's curving of spacetime is very slight but still significant enough that it must be accounted for in clocks of the Global Positioning Satellites (GPS) along with the other time dilation effect that is caused by speed. The GPS satellites are launched with their clocks adjusted so that when they reach orbit they mark time the same as Earth-based clocks do.

There have been serious attempts over the last few decades to construct theories of physics in which spacetime is a product of more basic entities. The primary aim of these new theories is to unify relativity with quantum theory. So far these theories have not stood up to any empirical observations or experiments that could show them to be superior to the presently accepted theories. So, for the present, the concept of spacetime remains fundamental.

The metaphysical question of whether spacetime is a substantial object or a relationship among events, or neither, is considered in the discussion of the relational theory of time.

6. What Is a Minkowski Spacetime Diagram?

A spacetime diagram is a graphical representation of the point-events in spacetime. A Minkowski spacetime diagram is a representation of a spacetime obeying the laws of special relativity. In a Minkowski spacetime diagram, normally a rectangular coordinate system is used, the time axis is shown vertically, one or two of the spatial axes are suppressed (that is, not included). Here is an example with only one space dimension:

This Minkowski diagram shows a point-sized Einstein standing still midway between the two places at which there is a flash of light. The directed arrows represent the path of light rays from the flash. In a Minkowski diagram, a physical (point) object is not represented as occupying a point but as occupying a line containing all the spacetime points at which it exists. That line, which usually is not straight, is called the worldline of the object. In the above diagram, Einstein's worldline is a vertical straight line because no total external force is acting on him. The history or path of an object’s inertial motion (its coasting) is a series of events that are represented by a straight line. If it is not straight, the object is not coasting (with zero external force acting on it).  If an object's worldline intersects or meets another object's worldline, then the two objects collide at the point of intersection. The units along the vertical time axis are customarily chosen to be the product of time and the speed of light so that worldlines of light rays make a forty-five degree angle with each axis. So, if a centimeter in the up or time direction is one second, then a centimeter to the right or space direction is one light-second, a very long distance.

The set of all possible photon histories or light-speed worldlines going through an event defines the two light cones of that event: the past light cone and the future light cone. The future cone is called a "cone" because, if we were to add another space dimension to our diagram, so it has two space dimensions and one time dimension, light emitted from the flash spreads out in the two dimensions of space in a circle of growing diameter, producing a cone shape. The future light cone of the flash event is all the space-time events reached by the light emitted from the flash. Events inside the cone are events that in principle could have been affected by the event; they events are said to be causally-connectible to the event, and the relation between any other event and the event is said to be time-like.

Inertial motion produces a straight worldline, and accelerated motion produces a curved worldline. If at some time Einstein were to jump on a train moving by at constant speed, then his worldline would, from that time onward, tilt away from the vertical and form some angle less than 45 degrees with the time axis. In order to force a 45 degree angle to be the path of a light ray, the units on the time axis are not seconds but seconds times the speed of light. Any line tilted from than 45 degrees from the vertical is the worldline of an object moving faster than the speed of light in a vacuum. Events on the same horizontal line of the Minkowski diagram are simultaneous in that reference frame. Special relativity does not allow a worldline to be circular, or a closed curve, since the traveler would have to approach infinite speed at the top of the circle and at the bottom. A moving observer is added to the above diagram to produce the diagram below in section 12 in the discussion about the relativity of simultaneity.

Does an observer move along their worldline? Is the worldline static and unchanging? According to J.J.C. Smart, "Within the Minkowski representation we must not talk of our four-dimensional entites changing or not changing." ("Spatialising Time," Mind, 64: 239-241.)

Not all spacetimes can be given Minkowski diagrams, but any spacetime satisfying Einstein's Special Theory of Relativity can. Minkowski diagrams are diagrams of a Minkowski space, which is a spacetime satisfying the Special Theory of Relativity and having zero vacuum energy. Einstein's Special Theory falsely presupposes that physical processes, such as gravitational processes, have no effect on the structure of spacetime. When attention needs to be given to the real effect of these processes on the structure of spacetime, that is, when general relativity needs to be used, then Minkowski diagrams become inappropriate for spacetime. General relativity assumes that the geometry of spacetime is locally Minkowskian but not globally. That is, spacetime is locally flat in the sense that in any very small region one always finds spacetime to be 4-D Minkowskian (but not 4-D Euclidean). Special relativity holds in infinitesimally small region of spacetime that satisfies general relativity, and so any such region can be fitted with an inertial reference frame. When we say spacetime is "really curved" and not flat, we mean it really deviates from 4-D Minkowskian geometry.

To repeat a point made earlier, when we speak of a point in these diagrams being a spacetime event, that is a non-standard use of the word "event." A point event in a Minkowski diagram is merely a location in spacetime where an event might or might not happen. The point exists even if no object is actually there.

7. What Are the Metric and the Interval?

A space is simply a collection of points. A metrification of the space assigns locations to the points by assigning them numbers or sets of numbers. It will assign the origin of a coordinate system on a 3-D space the location <0,0,0>. How far is it between any two points? The metric is the answer to this question. A metric on a space, whether it's a physical space or a mathematical space, provides a definition of distance (or length) by giving a function from each pair of points to a real number, called the distance between the points. In Euclidean space, the distance between two points is the length of the straight line connecting them. The metric of a space determines its geometry, and this metric and geometry are intrinsic in the sense that they do not change as we change the reference frame. Philosophers are interested in the issue of whether the choice of a metric for a space is natural (or objective) or whether it is always a matter of convention (or subjective).

How about the metric for time? The introduction of the metric for time allows the scientist to define the time interval between any two events, from which it follows that all pairs of events can be classified by the relation "earlier than" or "later than" or "simultaneous." In this way it defines the future and the past of any given event. The customary metric for any two points in a one-dimensional Euclidean space, such as time, is the absolute value of the numerical difference between the coordinates of the two points (that, the length of the line segment connecting them). For example, the duration between an event with the coordinate 5:00 and an event with the coordinate 7:00 is exactly two hours (assuming the events occur on the same day and we do not have an a.m. vs. p.m. ambiguity or ambiguity due to change of time zone). If we select a standard clock and the standard way of calculating durations between clock readings, then that clock implicitly defines the metric of time because, by definition, it yields the correct answer for the duration between any two point events. Here we assume the period between any two successive clock ticks is congruent (the same) while the clock is stationary in the coordinate system where the clock readings are taken. When we define the unit of time (the second) to be so many successive ticks of the standard clock, what we are doing is implicitly specifying the metric, provided we implicitly agree that the clock readings are correct and agree to adopt the customary procedure for how to read the duration between two point events. For example, to speak simplistically, if you want to know how much time has passed between the birth of Mohammed and the death of Abraham Lincoln, then you find the dates of the two events and subtract the first from the second; this procedure is equivalent to noting the tick on the standard clock that is simultaneous with the birth of Mohammed and then counting how many ticks occurred until the tick that is simultaneous with the death of Abraham Lincoln. It is customary to subtract the dates, but would it be incorrect instead to subtract the square roots of the dates, or to subtract the dates and then take the square root of the result? Philosophers disagree about whether it would be incorrect or merely inconvenient.

Points of space are located by being assigned a coordinate. For doing quantitative science rather than merely qualitative science we want the coordinate to be a number and not, say, a letter of the alphabet. A coordinate for a point in two-dimensional space requires two numbers; a coordinate for a point in n-dimensional space requires n numbers, where n is a positive integer. You might consider why you'd prefer a real number rather than a rational number even though no measuring tool could detect the difference between the two choices.

In a 2-dimensional (or 2-D) space, the metric for the distance between the point (x,y) with Cartesian coordinates x and y and the point (x',y') with coordinates x' and y' is defined to be the square root of (x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2 when the space is flat, that is, Euclidean. If the space is not flat, then a more sophisticated definition of the metric is required. Note the application of the Pythagorean Theorem.

We have intuitions about locations and distances that we expect will hold. For example, we believe that in a one-dimensional space representing time, if event p happens before event q, and q happens before r, then the locations numbers for those events, namely, l(p), l(q) and l(r), must satisfy this inequality: l(p) < l(q) < l(r). If not, then we shouldn't be labeling points that way.

Our intuitive idea of what a distance is tells us that, no matter how strange the space is, we want its metric d to have the following distance-like properties. Let d(p,q) stand for the distance between any two points p and q in the space. d is a function with two arguments. For any points p, q and r, the following five conditions must be satisfied:

  1. d(p,p) = 0
  2. d(p,q) is greater than or equal to 0
  3. If d(p,q) = 0, then p = q
  4. d(p,q) = d(q,p)
  5. d(p,q) + d(q,r) is greater than or equal to d(p,r)

Notice that there is no mention of the path the distance is taken across; all the attention is on the point pairs themselves. Does your idea of distance imply that those conditions on d should be true? If you were to check, then you'd find that the usual 2-D metric defined above, namely the square root of (x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2, does satisfy these four conditions. In 3-D Euclidean space, the metric that is defined to be the square root of (x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2 + (z' - z)2 works very well. So does the 1-D metric for the duration that we get for two instantaneous events by subtracting their clock readings; the duration between two instants p and q is the absolute value of the difference in their dates (that is, their clock readings or locations in time). In real physical space, the Euclidean metric works very well—at least for small regions (such as apartments and farms but not solar systems) that aren't too small (such as infinitesimally close to a proton). We might want a scale factor, say a, on the metric so that d2 = a[(x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2 + (z' - z)2]. If space were to expand uniformly, then a is not a constant but a function of time a(t). a(t) was zero at the Big Bang.

To have a metric for a spacetime, we desire a definition of the distance between any two infinitesimally neighboring points in that spacetime. Less generally, consider an appropriate metric for the 4-D mathematical space that is used to represent the spacetime obeying the laws of special relativity theory, namely Minkowski spacetime. What's an appropriate metric for this space? Well, if we were just interested in the space portion of this spacetime, then the above 3-D Euclidean metric is fine. But we've asked a delicate question because the fourth dimension of Minkowski's mathematical space is really a time dimension and not a space dimension. Using Cartesian coordinates, the spacetime has the following Lorentzian metric (or Minkowski metric) for any pair of point events at (x',y',z',t') and (x,y,z,t):

Δs2 = - (x' - x)2 - (y' - y)2 - (z' - z)2 + c2(t' - t)2

Δs is called the interval of Minkowski spacetime. Notice the plus and minus signs on the four terms. The interval corresponds to the difference in clock measurements between a pair of instantaneous events that happen at the same point place in the reference frame but are separated enough in time so that one event could have had a causal effect on the other. For a pair of events that occur at the same time in the frame but are separated in space, then the interval is what a meter stick would measure between the events. That is, Δs is then our spatial metric d. Most pairs of events, though, do not occur at the same place in the frame nor at the same time. One happy feature of this Lorentzian metric is that the value of the interval is unaffected by changing to a new reference frame or coordinate system provided the new one is not accelerating relative to the first. That is, changing to a new, unaccelerated reference frame on the spacetime will change the values of all the coordinates of the points of the spacetime, but some relations between all pairs of points won't be affected, namely the intervals between pairs of points. Thus there is something "absolute" about the metric; it is independent of unaccelerated reference frames. Take any two observers who use different reference frames that are not accelerating relative to each other. Now consider some single event with a finite duration. The two observers won't agree on how long that event lasts, nor where it occurs, but they will always agree on the interval between the beginning and end of the event. That's why the interval is said to be absolute.

The interval of spacetime between two point events is complicated because its square can be negative. If Δs2 is negative, the two points have a space-like separation, meaning these events have a greater separation in space than they do in time. If Δs2 is positive, then the two have a time-like separation, meaning enough time has passed that one event could have had a causal effect on the other. If Δs2 is zero, the two events might be identical, or they might have occurred millions of miles apart. In ordinary space, if the space interval between two events is zero, then the two events happened at the same time and place, but in spacetime, if the spacetime interval between two events is zero, this means only that there could be a light ray connecting them. It is because the spacetime interval between two events can be zero even when the events are far apart in distance that the term "interval" is very unlike what we normally mean by the term "distance." All the events that have a zero spacetime interval from some event e constitute e's two light cones. This set of events is given that name because it has the shape of cones when represented in a Minkowski diagram for 2-D space, one cone for events in e's future and one cone for events in e's past. If event 2 is outside the light cones of event 1, then event 2 is said to occur in the "absolute elsewhere" of event 1.

Another equally legitimate choice of a definition for a metric in Minkowskian 4-D spacetime is:

Δs2 =  (x' - x)2 + (y' - y)2 + (z' - z)2 - c2(t' - t)2

and now when Δs2 is positive we have a spacelike displacement instead of, as in the previous metric, a timelike displacement. Because true metrics are always positive, neither metric is a true metric, nor even a pseudometric; but it is customary for physicists to refer to it loosely as a "metric" because Δs retains enough other features of distance.

What if we turn now from special relativity to general relativity? Adding space and time dependence (particularly the values of mass-energy and momentum at points) to each term of the Lorentzian metric, the metric for special relativity, produces the metric for general relativity. That metric requires more complex tensor equations.

8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time Is Partly Space?

In 1908, Minkowski remarked that "Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality." Many people took this to mean that time is partly space, and vice versa. C. D. Broad countered that the discovery of spacetime did not break down the distinction between time and space but only their independence or isolation. He argued that their lack of independence does not imply a lack of reality.

Nevertheless, there is a deep sense in which time and space are "mixed up" or linked. This is evident from the Lorentz transformations of special relativity that connect the time t in one inertial frame with the time t' in another frame that is moving in the x direction at a constant speed v. In this Lorentz equation, t' is dependent upon the space coordinate x and the speed. In this way, time is not independent of either space or speed. It follows that the time between two events could be zero in one frame but not zero in another. Each frame has its own way of splitting up spacetime into its space part and its time part.

The reason why time is not partly space is that, within a single frame, time is always distinct from space. Time is a distinguished dimension of spacetime, not an arbitrary dimension. What being distinguished amounts to is that when you set up a rectangular coordinate system on spacetime with an origin at, say, the event of Mohammed's birth, you may point the x-axis east or north or up, but you may not point it forward in time—you may do that only with the t-axis, the time axis.

9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?

Yes and no; it depends on what you are talking about. Time is the fourth dimension of 4-d spacetime, but time is not the fourth dimension of space, the space of places.

Mathematicians have a broader notion of the term "space" than the average person; and in their sense a space need not consist of places, that is, geographical locations. Not paying attention to the two meanings of the term "space" is the source of all the confusion about whether time is the fourth dimension. The mathematical space used by mathematical physicists to represent physical spacetime is four dimensional and in that space, the space of places is a 3-d sub-space and time is another 1-d sub-space. Minkowski was the first person to construct such a mathematical space, although in 1895 H. G. Wells treated time as a fourth dimension in his novel The Time Machine. Spacetime is represented mathematically by Minkowski as a space of events, not as a space of ordinary geographical places.

In any coordinate system on spacetime, it takes at least four independent numbers to determine a spacetime location. In any coordinate system on the space of places, it takes at least three. That's why spacetime is four dimensional but the space of places is three dimensional. Actually this 19th century definition of dimensionality, which is due to Bernhard Riemann, is not quite adequate because mathematicians have subsequently discovered how to assign each point on the plane to a point on the line without any two points on the plane being assigned to the same point on the line. The idea comes from Georg Cantor. Because of this one-to-one correspondence, the points on a plane could be specified with just one number. If so, then the line and plane must have the same dimensions according to the Riemann definition. To avoid this problem and to keep the plane being a 2-d object, the notion of dimensionality of a space has been given a new, but rather complex, definition.

10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?

Every reference frame has its own physical time, but the question is intended in another sense. At present, physicists measure time electromagnetically. They define a standard atomic clock using periodic electromagnetic processes in atoms, then use electromagnetic signals (light) to synchronize clocks that are far from the standard clock. In doing this, are physicists measuring '"electromagnetic time" but not other kinds of physical time?

In the 1930s, the physicists Arthur Milne and Paul Dirac worried about this question. Independently, they suggested there may be very many time scales. For example, there could be the time of atomic processes and perhaps also a time of gravitation and large-scale physical processes. Clocks for the two processes might drift out of synchrony after being initially synchronized, yet there would be no reasonable explanation for why they don't stay in synchrony. Ditto for clocks based on the pendulum, on superconducting resonators, on the spread of electromagnetic radiation through space, and on other physical principles. Just imagine the difficulty for physicists if they had to work with electromagnetic time, gravitational time, nuclear time, neutrino time, and so forth. Current physics, however, has found no reason to assume there is more than one kind of time for physical processes.

In 1967, physicists did reject the astronomical standard for the atomic standard because the deviation between known atomic and gravitation periodic processes could be explained better assuming that the atomic processes were the more regular of the two. But this is not a cause for worry about two times drifting apart. Physicists still have no reason to believe a gravitational periodic process that is just as regular initially as the atomic process and that is not affected by friction or impacts or other forces would ever drift out of synchrony with the atomic process, yet this is the possibility that worried Milne and Dirac.

11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?

Physical time is not relative to any observer's state of mind. Wishing time will pass does not affect the rate at which the observed clock ticks. On the other hand, physical time is relative to the observer's reference system--in trivial ways and in a deep way discovered by Albert Einstein.

In a trivial way, time is relative to the chosen coordinate system on the reference frame, though not to the reference frame itself. For example, it depends on the units chosen as when the duration of some event is 34 seconds if seconds are defined to be a certain number of ticks of the standard clock, but is 24 seconds if seconds are defined to be a different number of ticks of that standard clock. Similarly, the difference between the Christian calendar and the Jewish calendar for the date of some event is due to a different unit and origin. Also trivially, time depends on the coordinate system when a change is made from Eastern Standard Time to Pacific Standard Time. These dependencies are taken into account by scientists but usually never mentioned. For example, if a pendulum's approximately one-second swing is measured in a physics laboratory during the autumn night when the society changes from Daylight Savings Time back to Standard Time, the scientists do not note that one unusual swing of the pendulum that evening took a negative fifty-nine minutes and fifty-nine seconds instead of the usual one second.

Isn't time relative to the observer's coordinate system in the sense that in some reference frames there could be fifty-nine seconds in a minute? No, due to scientific convention, it is absolutely certain that there are sixty seconds in any minute in any reference frame. How long an event lasts is relative to the reference frame used to measure the time elapsed, but in any reference frame there are exactly sixty seconds in a minute because this is true by definition. Similarly, you do not need to worry that in some reference frame there might be two gallons in a quart.

In a deeper sense, time is relative, not just to the coordinate system, but to the reference frame itself. That is Einstein's principal original idea about time. Einstein's special theory of relativity requires physical laws not change if we change from one inertial reference frame to another. In technical-speak Einstein is requiring that the statements of physical laws must be Lorentz-invariant. The equations of light and electricity and magnetism (Maxwell electrodynamics) are Lorentz-invariant, but those of Newton's mechanics are not, and Einstein eventually figured out that what needs changing in the laws of mechanics is that temporal durations and spatial intervals between two events must be allowed to be relative to which reference frame is being used. There is no frame-independent duration for an event extended in time.  To be redundant, Einstein's idea is that without reference to the frame, there is no fixed time interval between two events, no 'actual' duration between them. This idea was philosophically shocking as well as scientifically revolutionary.

Einstein illustrated his idea using two observers, one on a moving train in the middle of the train, and a second observer standing on the embankment next to the train tracks. If the observer sitting in the middle of the rapidly moving train receives signals simultaneously from lightning flashes at the front and back of the train, then in his reference frame the two lightning strikes were simultaneous. But the strikes were not simultaneous in a frame fixed to an observer on the ground. This outside observer will say that the flash from the back had farther to travel because the observer on the train was moving away from the flash. If one flash had farther to travel, then it must have left before the other one, assuming that both flashes moved at the same speed. Therefore, the lightning struck the back of the train before the lightning struck the front of the train in the reference frame fixed to the tracks.

Let's assume that a number of observers are moving with various constant speeds in various directions. Consider the inertial frame of reference in which each observer is at rest in his or her own frame. Which of these observers will agree on their time measurements? Only observers with zero relative speed will agree. Observers with different relative speeds will not, even if they agree on how to define the second and agree on some event occurring at time zero (the origin of the time axis). If two observers are moving relative to each other, but each makes judgments from a reference frame fixed to themselves, then the assigned times to the event will disagree more, the faster their relative speed. All observers will be observing the same objective reality, the same event in the same spacetime, but their different frames of reference will require disagreement about how spacetime divides up into its space part and its time part.

This relativity of time to reference frame implies that there be no such thing as The Past in the sense of a past independent of reference frame. This is because a past event in one reference frame might not be past in another reference frame. However, this frame relativity usually isn't very important except when high speeds or high gravitational fields are involved.

In some reference frame, was Adolf Hitler born before George Washington? No, because the two events are causally connectible. That is, one event could in principle have affected the other since light would have had time to travel from one to the other. We can select a reference frame to reverse the usual Earth-based order of two events only if they are not causally connectible, that is, only if one event is in the absolute elsewhere of the other. Despite the relativity of time to a reference frame, any two observers in any two reference frames should agree about which of two causally connectible events happened first.

12. What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?

Because the universe obeys relativistic physics, events that occur simultaneously with respect to one reference frame will not occur simultaneously in another reference frame that is moving with respect to the first frame. This is called the relativity of simultaneity.

In order to explain this point that the spatial 'plane' or 'time slice' of simultaneous events is different in different reference frames, notice that we calculate the time when something occurred far away by computing the difference between the time when a light signal arrives to us from the event minus the time it took for the light to travel all that way.  We see a flash of light at time t arriving from a distant place P. When did the flash occur back at P? Let's call the time of that earlier P-event tp. Here is how to compute tp. Suppose we know the distance from us to P is x. Then the flash occurred at t minus the travel time for the light. That travel time is x/c. So,

tp = t - x/c.

For example, if we see an explosion on the sun at t, then we know to say it really occurred eight minutes before, because x/c is approximately eight minutes, if x is the distance from Earth to the sun.

Calculations like this work fine for events in one reference frame, but they don't always work when we change reference frames. The diagram below illustrates the problem. There are two light flashes that occur simultaneously, with Einstein at rest midway between them.


The Minkowski diagram represents Einstein sitting still in the reference frame (marked by the coordinate system with the thick black axes) while Lorentz is not sitting still but is traveling rapidly away from him and toward the source of flash 2. Because Lorentz's timeline is a straight line we can tell that he is moving at a constant speed. The two flashes of light arrive at Einstein's location simultaneously, creating spacetime event B. However, Lorentz sees flash 2 before flash 1. That is, the event A of Lorentz seeing flash 2 occurs before event C of Lorentz seeing flash 1. So, Einstein will readily say the flashes are simultaneous, but Lorentz will have to do some computing to figure out that the flashes are simultaneous in the frame because they won't "look" simultaneous. However, if we'd chosen a different reference frame from the one above, one in which Lorentz is not moving but Einstein is, then Lorentz would be correct to say flash 2 occurs before flash 1 in that new frame. So, whether the flashes are or are not simultaneous depends on which reference frame is used in making the judgment. It's all relative.


13. What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?

This relativity of simultaneity is philosophically less controversial than the conventionality of simultaneity. To appreciate the difference, consider what is involved in making a determination regarding simultaneity. Given two events that happen essentially at the same place, physicists assume they can tell by direct observation whether the events happened simultaneously. If we don't see one of them happening first, then we say they happened simultaneously, and we assign them the same time coordinate. The determination of simultaneity is more difficult if the two happen at separate places, especially if they are very far apart. One way to measure (operationally define) simultaneity at a distance is to say that two events are simultaneous in a reference frame if unobstructed light signals from the two events would reach us simultaneously when we are midway between the two places where they occur, as judged in that frame. This is the operational definition of simultaneity used by Einstein in his theory of relativity. Instead of using the midway method, we could take the distant clock and send a signal home to our master clock, one already synchronized with our standard clock; the master clock immediately sends a signal back to the distant clock with the information about what time it was when the signal arrived. We at the distant clock notice that the total travel time is t and that the master clock's signal says its time is, say, noon, so we immediately set our clock to be noon plus half of t.

The "midway" method described above of operationally defining simultaneity in one reference frame for two distant signals causally connected to us has a significant presumption: that the light beams travel at the same speed regardless of direction. Einstein, Reichenbach and Grünbaum have called this a reasonable "convention" because any attempt to experimentally confirm it presupposes that we already know how to determine simultaneity at a distance. This is the conventionality, rather than relativity, of simultaneity. To pursue the point, suppose the two original events are in each other's absolute elsewhere; they couldn't have affected each other. Einstein noticed that there is no physical basis for judging the simultaneity or lack of simultaneity between these two events, and for that reason said we rely on a convention when we define distant simultaneity as we do. Hillary Putnam, Michael Friedman, and Graham Nerlich object to calling it a convention--on the grounds that to make any other assumption about light's speed would unnecessarily complicate our description of nature, and we often make choices about how nature is on the basis of simplification of our description. They would say there is less conventionality in the choice than Einstein supposed.

The "midway" method isn't the only way to define simultaneity. Consider a second method, the "mirror reflection" method. Select an Earth-based frame of reference, and send a flash of light from Earth to Mars where it hits a mirror and is reflected back to its source. The flash occurred at 12:00, let's say, and its reflection arrived back on Earth 20 minutes later. The light traveled the same empty, undisturbed path coming and going. At what time did the light flash hit the mirror? The answer involves the so-called conventionality of simultaneity. All physicists agree one should say the reflection event occurred at 12:10. The controversial philosophical question is whether this is really a convention. Einstein pointed out that there would be no inconsistency in our saying that it hit the mirror at 12:17, provided we live with the awkward consequence that light was relatively slow getting to the mirror, but then traveled back to Earth at a faster speed. If we picked the impact time to be 12:05, we'd have to live with the fact that light traveled slower coming back.

Let's explore the reflection method that is used to synchronize a distant, stationary clock so that it reads the same time as our clock. Let's draw a Minkowski diagram of the situation and consider just one spatial dimension in which we are at location A with the standard clock for the reference frame. The distant clock we want to synchronize is at location B. See the following diagram.

conventionality of simultaneity graph

The fact that the timeline of the B-clock is parallel to the time axis shows that the clock there is stationary. We will send light signals in order to synchronize the two clocks. Send a light signal from A at time t1 to B, where it is reflected back to us, arriving at time t3. Then the reading tr on the distant clock at the time of the reflection event should be t2, where

t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1).

If tr = t2, then the two clocks are synchronized.

Einstein noticed that the use of "(1/2)" in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) rather than the use of some other fraction implicitly assumes that the light speed to and from B is the same. He said this assumption is a convention, the so-called conventionality of simultaneity, and isn't something we could check to see whether it is correct. If t2 were (1/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B faster than c and return more slowly. If t2 were (2/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B relatively slowly and return faster than c. Either way, the average travel speed to and from would be c. Only with the fraction (1/2) are the travel speeds the same going and coming back.

Notice how we would check whether the two light speeds really are the same. We would send a light signal from A to B, and see if the travel time was the same as when we sent it from B to A. But to trust these times we would already need to have synchronized the clocks at A and B. But that synchronization process will use the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1), with the (1/2) again, so we are arguing in a circle here.

Not all philosophers of science agree with Einstein that the choice of (1/2) is a convention nor with those philosophers who say the messiness of any other choice shows that the choice must be correct. Everyone agrees, though, that any other choice than (1/2) would make for messy physics, but they suggest that there's a way to check on the light speeds without presuming the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) or presuming that the speeds are the same. Synchronize two clocks at A. Then transport one of the clocks to B at an infinitesimal speed. Going this slow, the clock will arrive at B without having its proper time deviate from that of the A-clock. That is, the two clocks will be synchronized even though they are distant from each other. Now the two clocks can be used to find the time when a light signal left A and the time when it arrived at B. The time difference can be used to compute the light speed. This speed can be compared with the speed computed for a signal that left B and then arrived at A. The experiment has never been performed, but the recommenders are sure that the speeds to and from will turn out to be identical, so they are sure that the (1/2) in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) is correct and not a convention. For more discussion of this controversial issue of conventionality in relativity, see pp. 179-184 of The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, edited by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, Inc., 2002.


14. What Is the Difference between the Past and the Absolute Past?


The events in your absolute past are those that could have directly or indirectly affected you, the observer, now. These absolutely past events are the events in or on the backward light cone of your present event, your here-and-now. The backward light cone of event Q is the imaginary cone-shaped surface of spacetime points formed by the paths of all light rays reaching Q from the past. An event's being in another event's absolute past is a feature of spacetime itself because the event is in the point's past in all possible reference frames. The feature is frame-independent. For any event in your absolute past, every observer in the universe (who isn't making an error) will agree the event happened in your past. Not so for events that are in your past but not in your absolute past. Past events not in your absolute past will be in what Eddington called your "absolute elsewhere" and these past events will be in your present as judged by some other reference frames. The absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime containing events that are not causally connectible to your here-and-now. Your absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime that is neither in nor on either your forward or backward light cones. No event here now, can affect any event in your absolute elsewhere; and no event in your absolute elsewhere can affect you here and now. A spacetime point's absolute future is all the future events outside the point's absolute elsewhere.

A single point's absolute elsewhere, absolute future, and absolute past partition all of spacetime beyond the point into three disjoint regions. If point A is in point B's absolute elsewhere, the two events are said to be "spacelike related." If the two are in each other's forward or backward light cones they are said to be "timelike related" or "causally connectible."

The past light cone looks like a triangle when the diagram has just one dimension for space. However, the past light cone is not a triangle but has a pear-shape because all very ancient light lines must have originated from the infinitesimal volume at the big bang.

15. What is Time Dilation?

According to special relativity, two properly functioning clocks next to each other will stay synchronized. Even if they were to be far away from each other, they'd stay synchronized if they didn't move relative to each other. But if one clock moves away from the other, the moving clock will tick slower than the stationary clock, as measured in the inertial reference frame of the stationary clock. This slowing due to motion is called "time dilation." If you move at 99% of the speed of light, then your time slows by a factor of 7 relative to stationary clocks. In addition, you are 7 times thinner than when you are stationary, and you are 7 times heavier. If you move at 99.9%, then you slow by a factor of 22.

Time dilation is about two synchronized clocks getting out of synchrony due either to their relative motion or due to their being in different gravitational fields. Time dilation due to difference in constant speeds is described by Einstein's special theory of relativity. The general theory of relativity describes a second kind of time dilation, one due to different accelerations and different gravitational influences. Suppose your twin's spaceship travels to and from a star one light year away. It takes light from your Earth-based flashlight two years to go there and back. But if the spaceship is fast, your twin can make the trip in less than two years, according to his own clock. Does he travel the distance in less time than it takes light to travel that distance? No, according to your clock he takes more than two years, and so is slower than light.

We sometimes speak of time dilation by saying time itself is "slower," but time isn't going slower in any absolute sense, only relative to some other frame of reference. Does time have a rate? Well, time in a reference frame has no rate in that frame, but time in a reference frame can have a rate as measured in a different frame, such as in a frame moving relative to the first frame.

Time dilation is not an illusion of perception; and it is not a matter of the second having different definitions in different reference frames.

Newton's physics describes duration as an absolute property, implying it is not relative to the reference frame. However, in Newton's physics the speed of light is relative to the frame. Einstein's special theory of relativity reverses both of these aspects of time. For inertial frames, it implies the speed of light is not relative to the frame, but duration is relative to the frame. In general relativity, however, the speed of light can vary within one reference frame if matter and energy are present.

Time dilation due to motion is relative in the sense that if your spaceship moves past mine so fast that I measure your clock to be running at half speed, then you will measure my clock to be running at half speed also, provided both of us are in inertial frames. If one of us is affected by a gravitational field or undergoes acceleration, then that person isn't in an inertial frame and the results are different.

Both types of time dilation play a significant role in time-sensitive satellite navigation systems such as the Global Positioning System. The atomic clocks on the satellites must be programmed to compensate for the relativistic dilation effects of both gravity and motion.

For more on general relativistic dilation, see the discussion of gravity and black holes.

16. How Does Gravity Affect Time?

Einstein's general theory of relativity (1915) is a generalization of his special theory of special relativity (1905). It is not restricted to inertial frames, and it encompasses a broader range of phenomena, namely gravity and accelerated motions. According to general relativity, gravitational differences affect time by dilating it. Observers in a less intense gravitational potential find that clocks in a more intense gravitational potential run slow relative to their own clocks. People live longer in basements than in attics, all other things being equal. Basement flashlights will be shifted toward the red end of the visible spectrum compared to the flashlights in attics. This effect is known as the gravitational red shift. Even the speed of light is slower in the presence of higher gravity.

Informally one speaks of gravity bending light rays around massive objects, but more accurately it is the space that bends, and as a consequence the light is bent, too. The light simply follows the shortest path through spacetime, and when space curves the shortest paths are no longer Euclidean straight lines.

17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?

A black hole is a body of matter with a very high gravitational field that constitutes a severe warp in the spacetime continuum, so much so that objects near the hole get pulled inside, and once inside the horizon surrounding the hole they cannot escape (normally). Even light cannot escape. The center within the hole is a nasty place called a "singularity" where the mass density is infinite, according to the general theory of relativity.

In principle, any material object can be turned into a black hole if it is sufficiently compressed. The Earth would become a black hole if it were somehow compressed to a radius of one centimeter. Just as in other galaxies, there is a massive black hole at the center of our galaxy, the Milky Way. It is in the direction of the constellation Sagittarius. Astrophysicists believe black holes are most commonly formed by the inward collapse of stars whose nuclear fuel has been exhausted. The center of a black hole (the singularity) is infinitely dense according to relativity theory; the singularity is only very, very dense according to theories of quantum gravity, but none of these theories have as yet been confirmed.

The radius of the black hole's event horizon is directly proportional to its mass; if the mass doubles, so does the radius of the horizon. The mass of the black hole in our galaxy is about a million times our sun’s mass.

If you observed an astronaut falling toward the event horizon, their light would become dimmer and redder, and their clock would tick progressively slower compared to your clock. You’d never see them actually reach the horizon no matter how long you waited, although in terms of their own personal time or proper time, they’d be quickly swept through the horizon and into the singularity where their volume would become infinitesimal.

Suppose you do get near the event horizon but are able to escape. What happens to your time? It will be dilated in the sense that, if you were to return home to Earth, you'd discover that you were younger than your Earth-bound twin. Your initially synchronized clocks would show that yours had fallen behind. It is in this sense that you would have experienced a time warp, a warp in the time component of spacetime.

Time inside a black hole is even stranger. In a certain sense, time becomes space, and vice versa. In a Minkowski diagram using polar coordinates, ordinary time is an axial dimension; but, just inside the event horizon of a black hole, time starts tilting until it becomes a radial dimension.

18. What Is the Solution to the Twin Paradox?

This paradox is also called the clock paradox and the twins paradox. It is an argument about time dilation that uses the special theory of relativity to produce a contradiction.  Consider two twins at rest on Earth with their clocks synchronized. One twin climbs into a spaceship and flies far away at a high, constant speed, then reverses course and flies back at the same speed. When they reunite, will the twins still be the same age? An application of the equations of special relativity theory implies that the twin on the spaceship will return and be younger than the Earth-based twin. Here is the argument for the twin paradox. It’s all relative, isn’t it? That is, either twin could regard the other as the traveler. Let's consider the spaceship to be stationary. Wouldn’t relativity theory then imply that the Earth-based twin could race off (while attached to the Earth) and return to be the younger of the two twins? If so, we have a contradiction because, when the twins reunite, each will be younger than the other.

Herbert Dingle famously argued in the 1960s that the paradox reveals an inconsistency in special relativity. Almost all philosophers and scientists now agree that it is not a true paradox, in the sense of revealing a logical inconsistency within relativity theory, but is merely a complex puzzle that can be adequately solved within relativity theory, although there is dispute about whether the solution can occur in special relativity or only in general relativity. Those who say the resolution of the twin paradox requires only special relativity are a small minority. Einstein said the solution to the paradox requires general relativity. Max Born said, "the clock paradox is due to a false application of the special theory of relativity, namely, to a case in which the methods of the general theory should be applied." In 1921, Wolfgang Pauli said, “Of course, a complete explanation of the problem can only be given within the framework of the general theory of relativity.”

There have been a variety of suggestions in the relativity textbooks on how to solve the paradox. Here is one, diagrammed below.

twin paradox

This suggestion for solving the paradox is to apply general relativity and then note that there must be a difference in the proper time taken by the twins because their behavior is different, as shown in their two world lines. The length of the line representing their path in spacetime in the above diagram is not a measure of their proper time. Instead, the spacing of the dots represents a tick of a clock and thus represents the proper time. The diagram shows how sitting still on Earth is a way of maximizing the proper during the trip, and it shows how flying near light speed in a spaceship away from Earth and then back again is a way of minimizing the proper time, even though if you paid attention only to the shape of the world lines and not to the dot spacing within them you might think just the reverse. Surprisingly, a straight world line between two events in a diagram like this has the longest proper time between two events, not the shortest. So, the reasoning in the paradox makes the mistake of supposing that the situation of the two twins is the same as far as elapsed proper time is concerned.

A second way to solve the twin paradox is to note that each twin can consider the other twin to be the one who moves, but their experiences will still be different because their situations are not symmetric. Regardless of which twin is considered to be stationary, only one twin feels the acceleration at the turnaround point, so it should not be surprising that the two situations have different implications about time. And when the gravitational fields are taken into considerations, the equations of general relativity do imply that the younger twin is the one who feels the acceleration. However, the force felt by the spaceship twin is not what "forces" that twin to be younger. Nothing is forcing the twin to be younger anymore than something is forcing the speed of light to remain constant.

A third suggestion for how to solve the paradox is to say that only the Earthbound twin can move at a constant velocity in a single inertial frame. If the spaceship twin is to be considered in an inertial frame and moving at a constant velocity, as required by special relativity, then there must be a different frame for the Earthbound twin's return trip than the frame for the outgoing trip. But changing frames in the middle of the presentation is an improper equivocation and shows that the argument of the paradox breaks down. In short, both twins' motions cannot always be inertial.

These three solutions, which are really variants of the same solution, tend to leave many people unsatisfied, probably because they think of the following situation. If we remove the stars and planets and other material from the universe and simply have two twins, isn't it clear that it would be inappropriate to say "there is an observable difference" due to one twin feeling an acceleration while the other does not? Won't both twins feel the same forces, and wouldn't relativity theory be incorrect if it implied that one twin returned to be younger than the other? (The correct answer to these questions is "yes.") Therefore, why does attaching the Earth to one of the twins force that twin to be the older one upon reunion? The answer to this last question requires appealing to general relativity. Notice that it is not just the Earth that is attached to the one twin. It is the Earth in tandem with all the planets and stars. When the spaceship-twin is considered to be at rest, then the planets and stars also rush away and back. Because of all this movement of mass, the turnaround isn't felt by the Earthbound twin who moves in tandem with those stars, but is felt very clearly by the spaceship twin. So, regardless of which twin is considered to be at rest, it is only the spaceship twin who feels any acceleration. Explaining this failure of the Earthbound twin to feel the force at the turnaround when the spaceship twin is at rest shows that a solution to the paradox ultimately requires a theory of the origin of inertia. But the point remains that the asymmetry in the experience of the two twins accounts for the aging difference and for the error in the argument of the twin paradox.

If you are the twin in the spaceship, then by flying fast and returning to Earth you do gradually advance into your twin's future, but your twin does not go to your past.

19. What Is the Solution to Zeno's Paradoxes?

See the article "Zeno's Paradoxes" in this encyclopedia.

20. How Do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?

To justify the assignment of time numbers (called dates or clock readings) to instants, we cannot literally paste a number to an instant. What we do instead is show that the structure of the set of instantaneous events is the same as the structure of our time numbers. The structure of our time numbers is the structure of real numbers along the mathematical line. Showing that this is so is called "solving the representation problem" for our theory of time measurement. We won't go into detail on how to solve this problem, but the main idea is that to measure any space, including a one-dimensional space of time, we need a metrification for the space. The metrification assigns location coordinates to all points and assigns distances between all pairs of points. The method of assigning these distances is called the “metric” for the space.  A metrification for time assigns dates and durations to the points we call instants of time. Normally we use a clock to do this. Point instants get assigned a unique real number date (a clock reading or date), and the metric for the duration between any two of those point instants is normally found by subtracting their clock readings from each other. The duration is the absolute value of the numerical difference of their dates, that is |t(B) - t(A)| where t(B) is the date of B and t(A) is the date of A. One goal in the assignment of dates is to ensure that, if event A happens before event B, then t(A) < t(B). (Unfortunately, we cannot trust the subtraction of one clock reading from another if one of the clocks is far away from our standard clock and if we are not sure how to reliably synchronize the distant clock with our standard clock; but we will explore this problem in a later section.)

Lets' consider the question of metrification in more detail, starting with the assignment of locations to points. Any space is a collection of points. In a space that is supposed to be time, these points are the instants and the space for time is presumably linear (since presumably time is one-dimensional). Before discussing time coordinates specifically, let's consider what is meant by assigning coordinates to a mathematical space, one that might represent either physical space, or physical time, or spacetime, or something else. In a one-dimensional space, such as a curving line, we assign unique coordinate numbers to points along the line, and we make sure that no point fails to have a coordinate. For a 2-dimensional space, we assign pairs of numbers to points. For a 3-d space, we assign triples of numbers. Why numbers and not letters? If we assign letters instead of numbers, we can not use the tools of mathematics to describe the space. But even if we do assign numbers we cannot assign any coordinate numbers we please. There are restrictions. If the space has a certain geometry, then we have to assign numbers that reflect this geometry. If event A occurs before event B, then the date of event A, namely t(A), must be less than t(B). If event B occurs after event A but before event C, then we should assign dates so that t(A) < t(B) < t(C). Here is the fundamental method of analytic geometry:

Consider a space as a class of fundamental entities: points. The class of points has "structure" imposed upon it, constituting it a geometry—say the full structure of space as described by Euclidean geometry. [By assigning coordinates] we associate another class of entities with the class of points, for example a class of ordered n-tuples of real numbers [for a n-dimensional space], and by means of this "mapping" associate structural features of the space described by the geometry with structural features generated by the relations that may hold among the new class of entities—say functional relations among the reals. We can then study the geometry by studying, instead, the structure of the new associated system [of coordinates]. (Sklar, 1976, p. 28)

The goal in assigning coordinates to a space is to create a reference system for the space. A reference system is a reference frame plus either a coordinate system or an atlas of coordinate systems placed by the analyst upon the space to uniquely name the points. These names or coordinates are frame dependent in that a point can get new coordinates when the reference frame is changed. For 4-d spacetime that obeys special relativity and its Lorentzian geometry, a coordinate system is a grid of smooth timelike and spacelike curves on the spacetime that assigns to each point three space coordinate numbers and one time coordinate number. No two distinct points can have the same set of four coordinate numbers. Inertial frames can have global coordinate systems, but in general we have to make due with atlases. If we are working with general relativity where spacetime can curve and we cannot assume inertial frames, then the best we can do is to assign a coordinate system to a small region of spacetime where the laws of special relativity hold to a good approximation. General relativity requires special relativity to hold locally, and thus for spacetime to be Euclidean locally. That means that locally the 4-d spacetime is correctly described by 4-d Euclidean solid geometry. Consider two coordinate systems on adjacent regions. For the adjacent regions we make sure that the 'edges' of the two coordinate systems match up in the sense that each point near the intersection of the two coordinate systems gets a unique set of four coordinates and that nearby points get nearby coordinate numbers. The result is an "atlas" on spacetime.

For small regions of spacetime, we create a coordinate system by choosing a style of grid, say rectangular coordinates, fixing a point as being the origin, selecting one timelike and three spacelike lines to be the axes, and defining a unit of distance for each dimension. We cannot use letters for coordinates. The alphabet's structure is too simple. Integers won't do either; but real numbers are adequate to the task. The definition of "coordinate system" requires us to assign our real numbers in such a way that numerical betweenness among the coordinate numbers reflects the betweenness relation among points. For example, if we assign numbers 17, pi, and 101.3 to instants, then every interval of time that contains the pi instant and the 101.3 instant had better contain the 17 instant. When this feature holds, the coordinate assignment is said to be monotonic.

The choice of the unit presupposes we have defined what "distance" means. The metric for a space specifies what is meant by distance in that space. The natural metric between any two points in a one-dimensional space, such as the time sub-space of our spacetime, is the numerical difference between the coordinates of the two points. Using this metric for time, the duration between an event with the coordinate 11 and the event with coordinate 7 is 5. The metric for spacetime defines the spacetime interval between two spacetime locations, and it is more complicated than the metric for time alone. The spacetime interval between any two events is invariant or unchanged by a change to any other reference frame, although the time interval can vary with change of frame. More accurately, in the general theory, the infinitesimal spacetime interval between two neighboring points is invariant. The units of the spacetime interval are seconds squared.

In this discussion, there is no need to worry about the distinction between change in metric and change in coordinates. For a space that is topologically equivalent to the real line and for metrics that are consistent with that topology, each coordinate system determines a metric and each metric determines a coordinate system. More precisely, once you decide on a positive direction in the one-dimensional space and a zero-point for the coordinates, then the possible coordinate systems and the possible metrics are in one-to-one correspondence.

There are still other restrictions on the assignments of coordinate numbers. The restriction that we called the "conventionality of simultaneity" fixes what time-slices of spacetime can be counted as collections of simultaneous events. An even more complicated restriction is that coordinate assignments satisfy the demands of general relativity. The metric of spacetime in general relativity is not global but varies from place to place due to the presence of matter and gravitation. Spacetime cannot be given its coordinate numbers without our knowing the distribution of matter and energy.

The features that a space has without its points being assigned any coordinates whatsoever are its topological features. These are its dimensionality, whether it goes on forever or has a boundary, how many points there are, and so forth.

21. How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?

Ideally for any reference frame we would like to partition the set of all actual events into simultaneity equivalence classes by some reliable method. All events in the same class are said to happen at the same time in the frame, and every event is in some class or other. Consider what event near the supergiant star Betelgeuse is happening at the same time as now. That is a difficult question to answer, so let's begin our discussion with some easier questions.

What is happening at time zero in our coordinate system? There is no way to select one point of spacetime and call it the origin of the coordinate system except by reference to actual events. In practice, we make the origin be the location of a special event. One popular choice is the birth of Jesus; another is the birth of Mohammed.

Our purpose in choosing a coordinate system or atlas is to express relationships among actual and possible events. The time relationships we are interested in are time-order relationships (Did this event occur between those two?) and magnitude-duration relationships (How long after A did B occur?) and date-time relationships (When did event A itself occur?). The date of a (point) event is the time coordinate number of the spacetime location where the event occurs. We expect all these assignments of dates to events to satisfy the requirement that event A happens before event B iff t(A) < t(B), where t(A) is the time coordinate of A, namely its date. The assignments of dates to events also must satisfy the demands of our physical theories, and in this case we face serious problems involving inconsistency as when a geologist gives one date for the birth of Earth and an astronomer gives a different date. By the way, in English the word "date" is ambiguous because we use it to stand for a specific time and also for the name of that specific time. In this article, we use the term both ways, hoping that the context indicates which way the word is intended.

It is a big step from assigning numbers to points of spacetime to assigning them to real events. Here are some of the questions that need answers. How do we determine whether a nearby event and a distant event occurred simultaneously? Assuming we want the second to be the standard unit for measuring the time interval between two events, how do we operationally define the second so we can measure whether one event occurred exactly one second later than another event? A related question is: How do we know whether the clock we have is accurate? Less fundamentally, attention must also be paid to the dependency of dates due to shifting from Standard Time to Daylight Savings Time, to crossing the International Date Line, to switching from the Julian to the Gregorian Calendar, and to comparing regular years with leap years.

Let's design a coordinate system for time. Suppose we have already assigned a date of zero to the event that we choose to be at the origin of our coordinate system. To assign dates to other events, we first must define a standard clock and declare that the time intervals between any two consecutive ticks of that clock are the same. The second, our conventional unit of time measurement, will be defined to be so many ticks of the standard clock. We then synchronize other clocks with the standard clock so the clocks show equal readings at the same time. The time or date at which a point event occurs is the number reading on the clock at rest there. If there is no clock there, the assignment process is more complicated.

We want to use clocks to assign a time even to very distant events, not just to events in the immediate vicinity of the clock. To do this correctly requires some appreciation of Einstein's theory of relativity. A major difficulty is that two nearby synchronized clocks, namely clocks that have been calibrated and set to show the same time when they are next to each other, will not in general stay synchronized if one is transported somewhere else. If they undergo the same motions and gravitational influences, they will stay synchronized; otherwise, they won't. There is no privileged transportation process that we can appeal to. For more on how to assign dates to distant events, see the discussion of the relativity and conventionality of simultaneity.

As a practical matter, dates are assigned to events in a wide variety of ways. The date of the birth of the Sun is assigned very differently from dates assigned to two successive crests of a light wave in a laboratory laser. For example, there are lasers whose successive crests of visible light waves pass by a given location in the laboratory every 10 to the minus 15 seconds. This short time isn't measured with a stopwatch. It is computed from measurements of the light's wavelength. We rely on electromagnetic theory for the equation connecting the periodic time of the wave to its wavelength and speed. Dates for other kinds of events, such as the birth of the Sun, also are often computed rather than directly measured with a clock.

22. What Is Essential to Being a clock?

Every clock, in the principal sense of the word “clock,” has two essential functions: to tick and to count. In order to tick it must generate a sequence of events that are nearly all of the same duration. To tick is to do the same thing over and over again. We need predictable, regular, cyclic behavior in order to measure time with a clock. In a pendulum clock, the cyclic behavior is the swings of the pendulum. In a digital clock, the cycles are oscillations in an electronic circuit. In a sundial, they are regular movements of a shadow. The rotating earth is a clock that ticks once a day. The revolving earth is a clock that ticks once a year.

The second essential function of any clock is to display a count of those periodic events. This count is a measure of the duration of the event that the clock is used for. The count is normally converted into seconds or some other standard unit of time. This counting can be especially difficult if the ticks are occurring a trillion times a second. A calendar is not a clock, but rather a record of the count of a clock's days and months. It is an arbitrary convention that we design clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time goes on. It is also a convention that we re-set our clock by one hour as we move across a time-zone on the earth's surface, or that we add leap days and leap seconds to our calendars.

The term “clock” is ambiguous, and there is another sense of the term in which all that is required of a clock is that it can be used to measure the duration of an event. If we have a process whose behavior is recognized to last a certain duration, then we sometimes use that process to measure the duration of another event that lasts the same duration and call this “using a clock.” For example, we have a candle that we agree takes an hour to burn down; we notice that the candle was lit at the beginning of dinner, then had burned down completely just as the dessert course was served, so we say we used a candle “clock” to measure the time from the beginning of the meal until dessert was served. Or we agree on how long the process of nuclear decay of a given amount of uranium into a given amount of lead takes, and then we measure the percentage of lead to uranium in volcanic rocks and say the volcano exploded a certain time ago, using our uranium-decay “clock” under the assumption that when the volcano exploded it contained no lead at all. Or we agree on the speed of light, and then say that some process has lasted just as long as light has taken to travel a certain distance. We say that we have measured the duration of that process with a “light clock” when we compute the duration from the distance information.

The goal in designing a clock is that it be accurate.

23. What Does It Mean for a Clock to be Accurate?

An accurate clock is a clock that is in synchrony with the standard clock. When the time measurements of the clock agree with the measurements made using the standard clock, we say the clock is accurate or properly calibrated or synchronized with the standard clock or simply correct. A perfectly accurate clock shows that it is time t just when the standard clock shows that it is time t, for all t. Accuracy is different from precision. If four clocks read exactly thirteen minutes slow compared to the standard clock, then the four are very precise, but they all are inaccurate by thirteen minutes.

One issue is whether the standard clock itself is accurate. Realists will say that the standard clock is our best guess as to what time it really is, and we can make incorrect choices for our standard clock. Anti-realists will say that the standard clock cannot, by definition, be inaccurate, so any choice of a standard clock, even the choice of the president's heartbeat as tour standard clock, will yield a standard clock that is accurate.

A clock isn't really measuring the time in a reference frame other than one fixed to the clock. It is not measure time "out there." In other words, a clock measures the elapsed proper time between events that occur along its own worldline. If the clock is in an inertial frame and not moving relative to the standard clock, then it measures the "coordinate time," the time we agree to use in the coordinate system. If the spacetime has no inertial frame, then that spacetime can't have an ordinary coordinate time.

Because clocks are intended to be used to measure events external to themselves, another goal in clock building is to ensure there is no difficulty in telling which clock tick is simultaneous with which events to be measured that are occurring away from the clock. For some situations and clocks, the sound made by the ticking helps us make this determination. We hear the tick just as we see the event occur that we desire to measure. [Note that we are ignoring the difference between the speed of sound and the speed of light.] But we might instead want to determine when the Sun comes up in the morning at some particular place where we and our clock are located.  Actually we are not interested in the Sun itself but in when the sunlight reaches our clock. In this situation, the time measurement is made by our seeing the first sunlight just when we see the digital clock face show a specific time of day. More accuracy in this kind of measurement process requires less reliance on human judgment.

In our discussion so far, we have assumed that the clock is very small, that it can count any part of a second and that it can count high enough to be a calendar. These aren't always good assumptions. Despite those practical problems, there is the theoretical problem of there being a physical limit to the shortest duration measurable by a given clock because no clock can measure events whose duration is shorter than the time it takes light to travel between the components of that clock, the components in the part that generates the sequence of regular ticks. This theoretical limit places a lower limit on the error margin of the measurement.

Every physical motion and every clock is subject to disturbances. So, to be an accurate clock that is in synchrony with the standard clock we want our clock to be adjustable in case it drifts out of synchrony a bit. It helps to keep it isolated from environmental influences such as heat, dust, unusual electromagnetic fields, physical blows (such as dropping the clock), and immersion in the ocean. And it helps to be able to be able to predict how much a specific influence affects the drift out of synchrony so that there can be an adjustment for this influence.

24. What Is Our Standard Clock?

We want to select as our standard clock a clock that we can be reasonably confident will tick regularly in the sense that all periods between adjacent ticks are congruent (the same duration). The international time standard used by most nations is called Coordinated Universal Time, or U.T.C. time, for the initials of the French name. It is not based on a single standard clock but rather on a large group of them. Here is how.

Atomic Time or A.T. time is what is produced by a cesium-based atomic fountain clock that counts in seconds, where those seconds are the S.I. seconds or Système International seconds (in the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d'Unités). The S.I. second is defined to be the time it takes for a standard cesium atomic clock to emit exactly 9,192,631,770 cycles of radiation produced as the clock’s cloud of cesium 133 atoms make a transition between two hyperfine levels of their ground state.

Actually, for the more precise timekeeping, the T.A.I. time scale is used rather than the A.T. scale. The T.A.I. scale does not use a single standard cesium clock but rather a calculated average of the readings of about 200 of the cesium atomic clocks that are distributed around the world in about fifty selected laboratories. One of those laboratories is the National Institute of Standards and Technology in Boulder, Colorado, U.S.A. This calculated average time is called T.A.I. time, the abbreviation of the French phrase for International Atomic Time. The International Bureau of Weights and Measures near Paris performs the averaging about once a month. If your laboratory had sent in your guess for what times "some" events occurred in the previous month according to your own clock, then in the following month, the Bureau would send you a report of how inaccurate your guess was, so you could make adjustments to your clock.

Coordinated Universal Time or U.T.C. time is T.A.I. time plus or minus some integral number of leap seconds. U.T.C. is, by agreement, the time at the Prime Meridian, the longitude that runs through Greenwich England. The official government time is different in different countries. In the U.S.A., for example, the government time is U.T.C. time minus the hourly offsets for the appropriate time zones of the U.S.A. including whether daylight savings time is observed. U.T.C. time is informally called Zulu Time, and it is the time used by the Internet and the aviation industry throughout the world.

A.T. time, T.A.I. time, and U.T.C. time are not kinds of physical time but rather kinds of measurements of physical time. So, this is another reason why the word "time" is ambiguous; sometimes it means unmeasured time, and sometimes it means the measure of that time. Speakers rarely take care to say explicitly how they are using the term, so readers need to stay alert, even in the present Supplement and in the main Time article.

By a convention in 1964 [by ratification by the General Conference of Weights and Measures for the International System of Units, which replaced what was called the old "metric system"], the standard clock is the clock that the ratifying nations agree to use for defining the so-called "standard second" or S.I. second. This second, which has been used by the U.S.A. since 1999, is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods (cycles, oscillations, vibrations) of a certain kind of microwave radiation emitted in the standard cesium clock. More specifically, the second is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods of the microwave radiation required to produce the maximum fluorescence of a small cloud of cesium 133 atoms (that is, their radiating a specific color of light) as the atoms make a transition between two specific hyperfine energy levels of the ground state of the atoms. This is the internationally agreed upon unit for atomic time [the T.A.I. system]. The old astronomical system [Universal Time 1 or UT1] defined a second to be 1/86,400 of an Earth day.

For this "atomic time," or time measured atomically, the atoms of cesium with a uniform energy are sent through a chamber that is being irradiated with microwaves. The frequency of the microwaves is tuned until maximum fluorescence is achieved. That is, it is adjusted until the maximum number of cesium atoms flip from one energy to the other, showing that the microwave radiation frequency is precisely tuned to be 9,192,631,770 vibrations per second. Because this frequency for maximum fluorescence is so stable from one experiment to the next, the vibration number is accurate to this many significant digits.

The meter depends on the second, so time measurement is more basic than space measurement. It does not follow, though, that time is more basic than space. The best way to measure length is to do it via measuring the number of periods of light, since light propagation is very stable or regular, and a light wave's frequency can also be made very stable, and because distance can't be measured as accurately as time. In 1999, the meter was defined in terms of the (pre-defined) second as being the distance light travels in a vacuum in an inertial frame in exactly 0.000000003335640952 seconds, or 1/299,792,458 seconds. That number is picked by convention so that the new meter will be very nearly the same distance as the old meter. The old meter was defined to be the distance between two specific marks on a platinum bar that was kept in the Paris Observatory. Time can be measured not only more accurately than distance but also more accurately than voltage, temperature, mass, or anything else.

One subtle implication of these standard definitions of the second and the meter is that they fix the speed of light in a vacuum in all inertial frames. The speed is exactly one meter per 0.000000003335640952 seconds or 299,792,458 meters per second, or approximately 186,282 miles per second or about three million football fields per second. There can no longer be any direct measurement to see if that is how fast light really moves; it is simply defined to be moving that fast. Any measurement that produced a different value for the speed of light would be presumed initially to have an error. The error would be in, say, its measurements of lengths and durations, or in its assumptions about being in an inertial frame, or in its adjustments for the influence of gravitation and acceleration, or in its assumption that the light was moving in a vacuum. This initial presumption of where the error lies comes from a deep reliance by scientists on Einstein's theory of relativity. However, if it were eventually decided by the community of scientists that the theory of relativity is incorrect and that the speed of light shouldn't have been fixed as it was, then the scientists would call for a new world convention to re-define the second.

Leap years (with their leap days) are needed as adjustments to the standard clock in order to account for the fact that the number of the Earth’s rotations per Earth revolution does not stay constant from year to year. Without that adjustment, our midnights will drift into the daylight. Leap seconds are needed for another reason. They are needed because the Earth does not rotate regularly and some days last longer than others. Unfortunately, the irregularity is not practically predictable, so when the irregularity occurs a leap second is added or subtracted every six months as needed to keep the time difference between atomic clocks and the Earth’s period of rotation to below 0.9 seconds.

25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better Than Others?

Other clocks ideally are calibrated by being synchronized to "the" standard clock, but some choices of standard clock are better than others. The philosophical question is whether the better choice is objectively better because it gives us an objectively more accurate clock, or whether the choice is a matter merely of convenience and makes our concept of time a more useful tool for doing physics. The issue is one of realism vs. instrumentalism. Let's consider the various goals we want to achieve in choosing one standard clock rather than another.

One goal is to choose a clock that doesn't drift very much. That is, we want a clock that has a very regular period—so the durations between ticks are congruent. Throughout history, scientists have detected that their currently-chosen standard clock seemed to be drifting. In about 1700, scientists discovered that the time from one day to the next, as determined by sunrises, varied throughout the year. Therefore, they decided to define durations in terms of the mean day throughout the year. Before the 1950s, the standard clock was defined astronomically in terms of the mean rotation of the Earth upon its axis [solar time]. For a short period in the 1950s and 1960s, it was defined in terms of the revolution of the Earth about the Sun [ephemeris time]. The second was defined to be 1/86,400 of the mean solar day, the average throughout the year of the rotational period of the Earth with respect to the Sun.

Now we've found a better standard clock, a certain kind of atomic clock [which displays "atomic time"] that was discussed in the previous section of this Supplement. All atomic clocks measure time in terms of the natural resonant frequencies of certain atoms or molecules. (The dates of adoption of these standard clocks was omitted in this paragraph because different international organizations adopted different standards in different years.) ==The U.S.A.'s National Institute of Standards and Technology's F-1 atomic fountain clock, that is used for reporting time in the U.S.A. (after adjustment so it reports the average from the other laboratories in the T.A.I. network), is so accurate that it drifts by less than one second every 300 million years. We know there is this drift because it is implied by the laws of physics, not because we have a better clock that measures this drift. With engineering improvements, the "300 million" number may improve.

In 2014 several physicists in the journal Nature Physics suggested someday replacing our current standard clock with a network of atomic clocks that are connected via quantum entanglement. They claim that this new clock would not lose a second in 1380 million years, which is the age of the universe.

To achieve the goal of restricting drift, we isolate the clock from outside effects. That is, a practical goal in selecting a standard clock is to find a clock that can be well insulated from environmental impact such as comets impacting the Earth, earthquakes, stray electric fields or the presence of dust. If not insulation, then we pursue the goal of compensation. If there is some theoretically predictable effect of the influence upon the standard clock, then the clock can be regularly adjusted to compensate for this effect.

Consider the insulation problem if we were to use as our standard clock the mean yearly motion of the Earth around the Sun. Can we compensate for all the relevant disturbing effects on the motion of the Earth around the Sun? Not easily. The problem is that the Earth's rate of spin varies in a practically unpredictable manner. Meanwhile, we believe that the relevant factors affecting the spin (such as shifts in winds, comet bombardment, earthquakes, the ocean's tides and currents, convection in Earth's molten core) are affecting the rotational speed and period of revolution of the Earth, but not affecting the behavior of the atomic clock. We don't want to be required to say that an earthquake on Earth or the melting of Greenland ice caused a change in the frequency of cesium emissions throughout the galaxies.

We add leap days and seconds in order to keep our atomic-based calendar in synchrony with the rotations and revolutions of the Earth. We want to keep atomic-noons occurring on astronomical-noons and ultimately to prevent Northern hemisphere winters from occurring in some future July, so we systematically add leap years and leap seconds and leap microseconds in the counting process. These changes do not affect the duration of a second, but they do affect the duration of a year because, with leap years, not all years last the same number of days. In this way, we compensate for the Earth-Sun clocks falling out of synchrony with our standard clock.

Another desirable feature of a standard clock is that reproductions of it stay in synchrony with each other when environmental conditions are the same. Otherwise we may be limited to relying on a specifically-located standard clock that can't be trusted elsewhere and that can be stolen. Cesium clocks in a suburb of Istanbul work just like cesium clocks in an airplane over New York City.

Because of the interplay of space with time in relativity theory, the choice of a standard clock depends not only on the simplicity of having a clock with regular ticks but also on the regularity of distances such as having all atoms in a molecular lattice be the same distance apart.

The principal goal in selecting a standard clock is to reduce mystery in physics by finding a periodic process that, if adopted as our standard, makes the resulting system of physical laws simpler and more useful. Choosing an atomic clock as standard is much better for this purpose than choosing the periodic dripping of water from our goat skin bag or even the periodic revolution of the Earth about the Sun. If scientists were to have retained the Earth-Sun clock as the standard clock and were to say that by definition the Earth does not slow down in any rotation or in any revolution, then when a comet collides with Earth, tempting the scientists to say the Earth's period of rotation and revolution changed , the scientists would be forced instead to alter, among many other things, their atomic theory and say the frequency of light emitted from cesium atoms mysteriously increases all over the universe when comets collide with Earth. By switching to the cesium atomic standard, these alterations are unnecessary, the mystery vanishes. Now scientists can explain that the non-uniform wobbling of the Earth's daily rotations and yearly revolutions is due to comet collisions--or is due to the effect of varying tides on the Earth, convection beneath the Earth's crust, our planet's encounters with dust, and the gravitational pull of the moon, Sun, and other planets. Without the change in standard clock, physicists would be faced with mysterious relationships among these factors; those factors could not be allowed to affect the period of rotation and revolution of the Earth if the periods had to be the same by definition.

To achieve the goal of choosing a standard clock that maximally reduces mystery, we want the clock's readings to be consistent with the accepted laws of motion, in the following sense. Newton's first law of motion says that a body in motion should continue to cover the same distance during the same time interval unless acted upon by an external force. If we used our standard clock to run a series of tests of the time intervals as a body coasted along a carefully measured path, and we found that the law was violated and we couldn't account for this mysterious violation by finding external forces to blame and we were sure that there was no problem otherwise with Newton's law or with the measurement of the length of the path, then the problem would be with the clock. Leonhard Euler [1707-1783] was the first person to suggest this consistency requirement on our choice of a standard clock. A similar argument holds today but with using the laws of motion from Einstein's theory of relativity.

What it means for the standard clock to be accurate depends on your philosophy of time. If you are a conventionalist, then once you select the standard clock it can not fail to be accurate in the sense of being correct. On the other hand, if you are an objectivist, you will say the standard clock can be inaccurate. There are different sorts of objectivists. Suppose we ask the question, "Can the time shown on a properly functioning standard clock be inaccurate?" The answer is "no" if the target is to be in synchrony with the current standard clock, as the conventionalists believe, but "yes" if there is another target. Objectivists can propose at least three distinct targets: (1) absolute time in Newton's sense, (2) the best possible clock, and (3) the best known clock. We do not have a way of knowing whether our current standard clock is close to target 1 or target 2. But if the best known clock has not yet been chosen to be the standard clock, then the current standard clock can be inaccurate in sense 3.

When you want to know how long a basketball game lasts, why do we subtract the start time from the end time? The answer is that we accept a metric for duration in which we subtract two time numbers to determine the duration between the two. Why don't we choose another metric and, let's say, subtract the square root of the start time from the square root of the end time? This question is implicitly asking whether our choice of metric can be incorrect or merely inconvenient.

Let's say more about this. When we choose a standard clock, we are choosing a metric. By agreeing to read the clock so that a duration from 3:00 to 5:00 is 5-3 hours or 2 hours,  we are making a choice about how to compare any two durations in order to decide whether they are equal, that is, congruent. We suppose the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 as shown by yesterday's reading of the standard clock was the same as the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 on the readings from two days ago, and will be the same for today's readings and tomorrow's readings. Philosophers of time continue to dispute the extent to which the choice of metric is conventional rather than objective in the sense of being forced on us by nature. The objectivist says the choice is forced and that the success of the standard atomic clock over the standard solar clock shows that we were more accurate in our choice of the standard clock. An objectivist disagrees and believes that whether two intervals of time are really equivalent is an intrinsic feature of nature, so choosing the standard clock is not any more conventional than our choosing to say the Earth is round rather than flat. Taking this conventional side on this issue, Adolf Grünbaum argues that time is "metrically amorphous." It has no intrinsic metric. Instead, we choose the metric we do in order only to achieve the goals of reducing mystery in science, but satisfying those goals is no sign of being correct.

The conventionalist as opposed to the objectivist would say that if we were to require by convention that the instant at which Jesus was born and the instant at which Abraham Lincoln was assassinated are to be only 24 seconds apart, whereas the duration between Lincoln's assassination and his burial is to be 24 billion seconds, then we could not be mistaken. It is up to us as a civilization to say what is correct when we first create our conventions about measuring duration. We can consistently assign any numerical time coordinates we wish, subject only to the condition that the assignment properly reflect the betweenness relations of the events that occur at those instants. That is, if event J (birth of Jesus) occurs before event L (Lincoln's assassination) and this in turn occurs before event B (burial of Lincoln), then the time assigned to J must be numerically less than the time assigned to L, and both must be less than the time assigned to B so that t(J) < t(L) < t(B). A simple requirement. Yes, but the implication is that this relationship among J, L, and B must hold for events simultaneous with J, and for all events simultaneous with K, and so forth. Another obvious implication is that the devices which served as good clocks according to one choice of metric will  not be good clocks according to a new choice of metric.

It is other features of nature that lead us to reject the above convention about 24 seconds and 24 billion seconds. What features? There are many periodic processes in nature that have a special relationship to each other; their periods are very nearly constant multiples of each other; and this constant stays the same over a long time. For example, the period of the rotation of the Earth is a fairly constant multiple of the period of the revolution of the Earth around the Sun, and both these periods are a constant multiple of the periods of a swinging pendulum and of vibrations of quartz crystals. The class of these periodic processes is very large, so the world will be easier to describe if we choose our standard clock from one of these periodic processes. A good convention for what is regular will make it easier for scientists to find simple laws of nature and to explain what causes other events to be irregular. It is the search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery that leads us to adopt the conventions we do for numerical time coordinate assignments and thus leads us to choose the standard clock we do choose. Objectivists disagree and say this search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery is all fine, but it is directing us toward the intrinsic metric, not simply the useful metric.

Back to the main “Time” article.


Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.

Simplicity in the Philosophy of Science

The view that simplicity is a virtue in scientific theories and that, other things being equal, simpler theories should be preferred to more complex ones has been widely advocated in the history of science and philosophy, and it remains widely held by modern scientists and philosophers of science. It often goes by the name of “Ockham’s Razor.” The claim is that simplicity ought to be one of the key criteria for evaluating and choosing between rival theories, alongside criteria such as consistency with the data and coherence with accepted background theories. Simplicity, in this sense, is often understood ontologically, in terms of how simple a theory represents nature as being—for example, a theory might be said to be simpler than another if it posits the existence of fewer entities, causes, or processes in nature in order to account for the empirical data. However, simplicity can also been understood in terms of various features of how theories go about explaining nature—for example, a theory might be said to be simpler than another if it contains fewer adjustable parameters, if it invokes fewer extraneous assumptions, or if it provides a more unified explanation of the data.

Preferences for simpler theories are widely thought to have played a central role in many important episodes in the history of science. Simplicity considerations are also regarded as integral to many of the standard methods that scientists use for inferring hypotheses from empirical data, the most of common illustration of this being the practice of curve-fitting. Indeed, some philosophers have argued that a systematic bias towards simpler theories and hypotheses is a fundamental component of inductive reasoning quite generally.

However, though the legitimacy of choosing between rival scientific theories on grounds of simplicity is frequently taken for granted, or viewed as self-evident, this practice raises a number of very difficult philosophical problems. A common concern is that notions of simplicity appear vague, and judgments about the relative simplicity of particular theories appear irredeemably subjective. Thus, one problem is to explain more precisely what it is for theories to be simpler than others and how, if at all, the relative simplicity of theories can be objectively measured. In addition, even if we can get clearer about what simplicity is and how it is to be measured, there remains the problem of explaining what justification, if any, can be provided for choosing between rival scientific theories on grounds of simplicity. For instance, do we have any reason for thinking that simpler theories are more likely to be true?

This article provides an overview of the debate over simplicity in the philosophy of science. Section 1 illustrates the putative role of simplicity considerations in scientific methodology, outlining some common views of scientists on this issue, different formulations of Ockham’s Razor, and some commonly cited examples of simplicity at work in the history and current practice of science. Section 2 highlights the wider significance of the philosophical issues surrounding simplicity for central controversies in the philosophy of science and epistemology. Section 3 outlines the challenges facing the project of trying to precisely define and measure theoretical simplicity, and it surveys the leading measures of simplicity and complexity currently on the market. Finally, Section 4 surveys the wide variety of attempts that have been made to justify the practice of choosing between rival theories on grounds of simplicity.

Table of Contents

  1. The Role of Simplicity in Science
    1. Ockham’s Razor
    2. Examples of Simplicity Preferences at Work in the History of Science
      1. Newton’s Argument for Universal Gravitation
      2. Other Examples
    3. Simplicity and Inductive Inference
    4. Simplicity in Statistics and Data Analysis
  2. Wider Philosophical Significance of Issues Surrounding Simplicity
  3. Defining and Measuring Simplicity
    1. Syntactic Measures
    2. Goodman’s Measure
    3. Simplicity as Testability
    4. Sober’s Measure
    5. Thagard’s Measure
    6. Information-Theoretic Measures
    7. Is Simplicity a Unified Concept?
  4. Justifying Preferences for Simpler Theories
    1. Simplicity as an Indicator of Truth
      1. Nature is Simple
      2. Meta-Inductive Proposals
      3. Bayesian Proposals
      4. Simplicity as a Fundamental A Priori Principle
    2. Alternative Justifications
      1. Falsifiability
      2. Simplicity as an Explanatory Virtue
      3. Predictive Accuracy
      4. Truth-Finding Efficiency
    3. Deflationary Approaches
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Role of Simplicity in Science

There are many ways in which simplicity might be regarded as a desirable feature of scientific theories. Simpler theories are frequently said to be more “beautiful” or more “elegant” than their rivals; they might also be easier to understand and to work with. However, according to many scientists and philosophers, simplicity is not something that is merely to be hoped for in theories; nor is it something that we should only strive for after we have already selected a theory that we believe to be on the right track (for example, by trying to find a simpler formulation of an accepted theory). Rather, the claim is that simplicity should actually be one of the key criteria that we use to evaluate which of a set of rival theories is, in fact, the best theory, given the available evidence: other things being equal, the simplest theory consistent with the data is the best one.

This view has a long and illustrious history. Though it is now most commonly associated with the 14th century philosopher, William of Ockham (also spelt “Occam”), whose name is attached to the famous methodological maxim known as “Ockham’s razor”, which is often interpreted as enjoining us to prefer the simplest theory consistent with the available evidence, it can be traced at least as far back as Aristotle. In his Posterior Analytics, Aristotle argued that nothing in nature was done in vain and nothing was superfluous, so our theories of nature should be as simple as possible. Several centuries later, at the beginning of the modern scientific revolution, Galileo espoused a similar view, holding that, “[n]ature does not multiply things unnecessarily; that she makes use of the easiest and simplest means for producing her effects” (Galilei, 1962, p396). Similarly, at beginning of the third book of the Principia, Isaac Newton included the following principle among his “rules for the study of natural philosophy”:

  • No more causes of natural things should be admitted than are both true and sufficient to explain their phenomena.
    As the philosophers say: Nature does nothing in vain, and more causes are in vain when fewer will suffice. For Nature is simple and does not indulge in the luxury of superfluous causes. (Newton, 1999, p794 [emphasis in original]).

In the 20th century, Albert Einstein asserted that “our experience hitherto justifies us in believing that nature is the realisation of the simplest conceivable mathematical ideas” (Einstein, 1954, p274). More recently, the eminent physicist Steven Weinberg has claimed that he and his fellow physicists “demand simplicity and rigidity in our principles before we are willing to take them seriously” (Weinberg, 1993, p148-9), while the Nobel prize winning economist John Harsanyi has stated that “[o]ther things being equal, a simpler theory will be preferable to a less simple theory” (quoted in McAlleer, 2001, p296).

It should be noted, however, that not all scientists agree that simplicity should be regarded as a legitimate criterion for theory choice. The eminent biologist Francis Crick once complained, “[w]hile Occam’s razor is a useful tool in physics, it can be a very dangerous implement in biology. It is thus very rash to use simplicity and elegance as a guide in biological research” (Crick, 1988, p138). Similarly, here are a group of earth scientists writing in Science:

  • Many scientists accept and apply [Ockham’s Razor] in their work, even though it is an entirely metaphysical assumption. There is scant empirical evidence that the world is actually simple or that simple accounts are more likely than complex ones to be true. Our commitment to simplicity is largely an inheritance of 17th-century theology. (Oreskes et al, 1994, endnote 25)

Hence, while very many scientists assert that rival theories should be evaluated on grounds of simplicity, others are much more skeptical about this idea. Much of this skepticism stems from the suspicion that the cogency of a simplicity criterion depends on assuming that nature is simple (hardly surprising given the way that many scientists have defended such a criterion) and that we have no good reason to make such an assumption. Crick, for instance, seemed to think that such an assumption could make no sense in biology, given the patent complexity of the biological world. In contrast, some advocates of simplicity have argued that a preference for simple theories need not necessarily assume a simple world—for instance, even if nature is demonstrably complex in an ontological sense, we should still prefer comparatively simple explanations for nature’s complexity. Oreskes and others also emphasize that the simplicity principles of scientists such as Galileo and Newton were explicitly rooted in a particular kind of natural theology, which held that a simple and elegant universe was a necessary consequence of God’s benevolence. Today, there is much less enthusiasm for grounding scientific methods in theology (the putative connection between God’s benevolence and the simplicity of creation is theologically controversial in any case). Another common source of skepticism is the apparent vagueness of the notion of simplicity and the suspicion that scientists’ judgments about the relative simplicity of theories lack a principled and objective basis.

Even so, there is no doubting the popularity of the idea that simplicity should be used as a criterion for theory choice and evaluation. It seems to be explicitly ingrained into many scientific methods—for instance, standard statistical methods of data analysis (Section 1d). It has also spread far beyond philosophy and the natural sciences. A recent issue of the FBI Law Enforcement Bulletin, for instance, contained the advice that “[u]nfortunately, many people perceive criminal acts as more complex than they really are… the least complicated explanation of an event is usually the correct one” (Rothwell, 2006, p24).

a. Ockham’s Razor

Many scientists and philosophers endorse a methodological principle known as “Ockham’s Razor”. This principle has been formulated in a variety of different ways. In the early 21st century, it is typically just equated with the general maxim that simpler theories are “better” than more complex ones, other things being equal. Historically, however, it has been more common to formulate Ockham’s Razor as a more specific type of simplicity principle, often referred to as “the principle of parsimony”. Whether William of Ockham himself would have endorsed any of the wide variety of methodological maxims that have been attributed to him is a matter of some controversy (see Thorburn, 1918; entry on William of Ockham), since Ockham never explicitly referred to a methodological principle that he called his “razor”. However, a standard of formulation of the principle of parsimony—one that seems to be reasonably close to the sort of principle that Ockham himself probably would have endorsed—is as the maxim “entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity”. So stated, the principle is ontological, since it is concerned with parsimony with respect to the entities that theories posit the existence of in attempting to account for the empirical data. “Entity”, in this context, is typically understood broadly, referring not just to objects (for example, atoms and particles), but also to other kinds of natural phenomena that a theory may include in its ontology, such as causes, processes, properties, and so forth. Other, more general formulations of Ockham’s Razor are not exclusively ontological, and may also make reference to various structural features of how theories go about explaining nature, such as the unity of their explanations. The remainder of this section will focus on the more traditional ontological interpretation.

It is important to recognize that the principle, “entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity” can be read in at least two different ways. One way of reading it is as what we can call an anti-superfluity principle (Barnes, 2000). This principle calls for the elimination of ontological posits from theories that are explanatorily redundant. Suppose, for instance, that there are two theories, T1 and T2, which both seek to explain the same set of empirical data, D. Suppose also that T1 and T2 are identical in terms of the entities that are posited, except for the fact that T2 entails an additional posit, b, that is not part of T1. So let us say that T1 posits a, while T2 posits a + b. Intuitively, T2 is a more complex theory than T1 because it posits more things. Now let us assume that both theories provide an equally complete explanation of D, in the sense that there are no features of D that the two theories cannot account for. In this situation, the anti-superfluity principle would instruct us to prefer the simpler theory, T1, to the more complex theory, T2. The reason for this is because T2 contains an explanatorily redundant posit, b, which does no explanatory work in the theory with respect to D. We know this because T1, which posits a alone provides an equally adequate account of D as T2. Hence, we can infer that positing a alone is sufficient to acquire all the explanatory ability offered by T2, with respect to D; adding b does nothing to improve the ability of T2 to account for the data.

This sort of anti-superfluity principle underlies one important interpretation of “entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity”: as a principle that invites us to get rid of superfluous components of theories. Here, an ontological posit is superfluous with respect to a given theory, T, in so far as it does nothing to improve T’s ability to account for the phenomena to be explained. This is how John Stuart Mill understood Ockham’s razor (Mill, 1867, p526). Mill also pointed to a plausible justification for the anti-superfluity principle: explanatorily redundant posits—those that have no effect on the ability of the theory to explain the data—are also posits that do not obtain evidential support from the data. This is because it is plausible that theoretical entities are evidentially supported by empirical data only to the extent that they can help us to account for why the data take the form that they do. If a theoretical entity fails to contribute to this end, then the data fails to confirm the existence of this entity. If we have no other independent reason to postulate the existence of this entity, then we have no justification for including this entity in our theoretical ontology.

Another justification that has been offered for the anti-superfluity principle is a probabilistic one. Note that T2 is a logically stronger theory than T1: T2 says that a and b exist, while T1 says that only a exists. It is a consequence of the axioms of probability that a logically stronger theory is always less probable than a logically weaker theory, thus, so long as the probability of a existing and the probability of b existing are independent of each other, the probability of a existing is greater than zero, and the probability of b existing is less than 1, we can assert that Pr (a exists) > Pr (a exists & b exists), where Pr (a exists & b exists) = Pr (a exists) * Pr (b exists). According to this reasoning, we should therefore regard the claims of T1 as more a priori probable than the claims of T2, and this is a reason to prefer it. However, one objection to this probabilistic justification for the anti-superfluity principle is that it doesn’t fully explain why we dislike theories that posit explanatorily redundant entities: it can’t really because they are logically stronger theories; rather it is because they postulate entities that are unsupported by evidence.

When the principle of parsimony is read as an anti-superfluity principle, it seems relatively uncontroversial. However, it is important to recognize that the vast majority of instances where the principle of parsimony is applied (or has been seen as applying) in science cannot be given an interpretation merely in terms of the anti-superfluity principle. This is because the phrase “entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity” is normally read as what we can call an anti-quantity principle: theories that posit fewer things are (other things being equal) to be preferred to theories that posit more things, whether or not the relevant posits play any genuine explanatory role in the theories concerned (Barnes, 2000). This is a much stronger claim than the claim that we should razor off explanatorily redundant entities. The evidential justification for the anti-superfluity principle just described cannot be used to motivate the anti-quantity principle, since the reasoning behind this justification allows that we can posit as many things as we like, so long as all of the individual posits do some explanatory work within the theory. It merely tells us to get rid of theoretical ontology that, from the perspective of a given theory, is explanatorily redundant. It does not tell us that theories that posit fewer things when accounting for the data are better than theories that posit more things—that is, that sparser ontologies are better than richer ones.

Another important point about the anti-superfluity principle is that it does not give us a reason to assert the non-existence of the superfluous posit. Absence of evidence, is not (by itself) evidence for absence. Hence, this version of Ockham’s razor is sometimes also referred to as an “agnostic” razor rather than an “atheistic” razor, since it only motivates us to be agnostic about the razored-off ontology (Sober, 1981). It seems that in most cases where Ockham’s razor is appealed to in science it is intended to support atheistic conclusions—the entities concerned are not merely cut out of our theoretical ontology, their existence is also denied. Hence, if we are to explain why such a preference is justified we need will to look for a different justification. With respect to the probabilistic justification for the anti-superfluity principle described above, it is important to note that it is not an axiom of probability that Pr (a exists & b doesn’t exist) > Pr (a exists & b exists).

b. Examples of Simplicity Preferences at Work in the History of Science

It is widely believed that there have been numerous episodes in the history of science where particular scientific theories were defended by particular scientists and/or came to be preferred by the wider scientific community less for directly empirical reasons (for example, some telling experimental finding) than as a result of their relative simplicity compared to rival theories. Hence, the history of science is taken to demonstrate the importance of simplicity considerations in how scientists defend, evaluate, and choose between theories. One striking example is Isaac Newton’s argument for universal gravitation.

i. Newton’s Argument for Universal Gravitation

At beginning of the third book of the Principia, subtitled “The system of the world”, Isaac Newton described four “rules for the study of natural philosophy”:

  • Rule 1 No more causes of natural things should be admitted than are both true and sufficient to explain their phenomena.
  • As the philosophers say: Nature does nothing in vain, and more causes are in vain when fewer will suffice. For Nature is simple and does not indulge in the luxury of superfluous causes.
  • Rule 2 Therefore, the causes assigned to natural effects of the same kind must be, so far as possible, the same.
  • Rule 3 Those qualities of bodies that cannot be intended and remitted [i.e., qualities that cannot be increased and diminished] and that belong to all bodies on which experiments can be made should be taken as qualities of all bodies universally.
  • For the qualities of bodies can be known only through experiments; and therefore qualities that square with experiments universally are to be regarded as universal qualities… Certainly ideal fancies ought not to be fabricated recklessly against the evidence of experiments, nor should we depart from the analogy of nature, since nature is always simple and ever consonant with itself…
  • Rule 4 In experimental philosophy, propositions gathered from phenomena by induction should be considered either exactly or very nearly true notwithstanding any contrary hypotheses, until yet other phenomena make such propositions either more exact or liable to exceptions.
  • This rule should be followed so that arguments based on induction may not be nullified by hypotheses. (Newton, 1999, p794-796).

Here we see Newton explicitly placing simplicity at the heart of his conception of the scientific method. Rule 1, a version of Ockham’s Razor, which, despite the use of the word “superfluous”, has typically been read as an anti-quantity principle rather than an anti-superfluity principle (see Section 1a), is taken to follow directly from the assumption that nature is simple, which is in turn taken to give rise to rules 2 and 3, both principles of inductive generalization (infer similar causes for similar effects, and assume to be universal in all bodies those properties found in all observed bodies). These rules play a crucial role in what follows, the centrepiece being the argument for universal gravitation.

After laying out these rules of method, Newton described several “phenomena”—what are in fact empirical generalizations, derived from astronomical observations, about the motions of the planets and their satellites, including the moon. From these phenomena and the rules of method, he then “deduced” several general theoretical propositions. Propositions 1, 2, and 3 state that the satellites of Jupiter, the primary planets, and the moon are attracted towards the centers of Jupiter, the sun, and the earth respectively by forces that keep them in their orbits (stopping them from following a linear path in the direction of their motion at any one time). These forces are also claimed to vary inversely with the square of the distance of the orbiting body (for example, Mars) from the center of the body about which it orbits (for example, the sun). These propositions are taken to follow from the phenomena, including the fact that the respective orbits can be shown to (approximately) obey Kepler’s law of areas and the harmonic law, and the laws of motion developed in book 1 of the Principia. Newton then asserted proposition 4: “The moon gravitates toward the earth and by the force of gravity is always drawn back from rectilinear motion and kept in its orbit” (p802). In other words, it is the force of gravity that keeps the moon in its orbit around the earth. Newton explicitly invoked rules 1 and 2 in the argument for this proposition (what has become known as the “moon-test”). First, astronomical observations told us how fast the moon accelerates towards the earth. Newton was then able to calculate what the acceleration of the moon would be at the earth’s surface, if it were to fall down to the earth. This turned out to be equal to the acceleration of bodies observed to fall in experiments conducted on earth. Since it is the force of gravity that causes bodies on earth to fall (Newton assumed his readers’ familiarity with “gravity” in this sense), and since both gravity and the force acting on the moon “are directed towards the center of the earth and are similar to each other and equal”, Newton asserted that “they will (by rules 1 and 2) have the same cause” (p805). Therefore, the forces that act on falling bodies on earth, and which keeps the moon in its orbit are one and the same: gravity. Given this, the force of gravity acting on terrestrial bodies could now be claimed to obey an inverse-square law. Through similar deployment of rules 1, 2, and 4, Newton was led to the claim that it is also gravity that keeps the planets in their orbits around the sun and the satellites of Jupiter and Saturn in their orbits, since these forces are also directed toward the centers of the sun, Jupiter, and Saturn, and display similar properties to the force of gravity on earth, such as the fact that they obey an inverse-square law. Therefore, the force of gravity was held to act on all planets universally. Through several more steps, Newton was eventually able to get to the principle of universal gravitation: that gravity is a mutually attractive force that acts on any two bodies whatsoever and is described by an inverse-square law, which says that the each body attracts the other with a force of equal magnitude that is proportional to the product of the masses of the two bodies and inversely proportional to the squared distance between them. From there, Newton was able to determine the masses and densities of the sun, Jupiter, Saturn, and the earth, and offer a new explanation for the tides of the seas, thus showing the remarkable explanatory power of this new physics.

Newton’s argument has been the subject of much debate amongst historians and philosophers of science (for further discussion of the various controversies surrounding its structure and the accuracy of its premises, see Glymour, 1980; Cohen, 1999; Harper, 2002). However, one thing that seems to be clear is that his conclusions are by no means forced on us through simple deductions from the phenomena, even when combined with the mathematical theorems and general theory of motion outlined in book 1 of the Principia. No experiment or mathematical derivation from the phenomena demonstrated that it must be gravity that is the common cause of the falling of bodies on earth, the orbits of the moon, the planets and their satellites, much less that gravity is a mutually attractive force acting on all bodies whatsoever. Rather, Newton’s argument appears to boil down to the claim that if gravity did have the properties accorded to it by the principle of universal gravitation, it could provide a common causal explanation for all the phenomena, and his rules of method tell us to infer common causes wherever we can. Hence, the rules, which are in turn grounded in a preference for simplicity, play a crucial role in taking us from the phenomena to universal gravitation (for further discussion of the apparent link between simplicity and common cause reasoning, see Sober, 1988). Newton’s argument for universal gravitation can thus be seen as argument to the putatively simplest explanation for the empirical observations.

ii. Other Examples

Numerous other putative examples of simplicity considerations at work in the history of science have been cited in the literature:

  • One of the most commonly cited concerns Copernicus’ arguments for the heliocentric theory of planetary motion. Copernicus placed particular emphasis on the comparative “simplicity” and “harmony” of the account that his theory gave of the motions of the planets compared with the rival geocentric theory derived from the work of Ptolemy. This argument appears to have carried significant weight for Copernicus’ successors, including Rheticus, Galileo, and Kepler, who all emphasized simplicity as a major motivation for heliocentrism. Philosophers have suggested various reconstructions of the Copernican argument (see for example, Glymour, 1980; Rosencrantz, 1983; Forster and Sober, 1994; Myrvold, 2003; Martens, 2009). However, historians of science have questioned the extent to which simplicity could have played a genuine rather than purely rhetorical role in this episode. For example, it has been argued that there is no clear sense in which the Copernican system was in fact simpler than Ptolemy’s, and that geocentric systems such as the Tychronic system could be constructed that were at least as simple as the Copernican one (for discussion, see Kuhn, 1957; Palter, 1970; Cohen, 1985; Gingerich, 1993; Martens, 2009).
  • It has been widely claimed that simplicity played a key role in the development of Einstein’s theories of theories of special and general relativity, and in the early acceptance of Einstein’s theories by the scientific community (see for example, Hesse, 1974; Holton, 1974; Schaffner, 1974; Sober, 1981; Pais, 1982; Norton, 2000).
  • Thagard (1988) argues that simplicity considerations played an important role in Lavoisier’s case against the existence of phlogiston and in favour of the oxygen theory of combustion.
  • Carlson (1966) describes several episodes in the history of genetics in which simplicity considerations seemed to have held sway.
  • Nolan (1997) argues that a preference for ontological parsimony played an important role in the discovery of the neutrino and in the proposal of Avogadro’s hypothesis.
  • Baker (2007) argues that ontological parsimony was a key issue in discussions over rival dispersalist and extensionist bio-geographical theories in the late 19th and early 20th century.

Though it is commonplace for scientists and philosophers to claim that simplicity considerations have played a significant role in the history of science, it is important to note that some skeptics have argued that the actual historical importance of simplicity considerations has been over-sold (for example, Bunge, 1961; Lakatos and Zahar, 1978). Such skeptics dispute the claim that we can only explain the basis for these and other episodes of theory change by according a role to simplicity, claiming other considerations actually carried more weight. In addition, it has been argued that, in many cases, what appear on the surface to have been appeals to the relative simplicity of theories were in fact covert appeals to some other theoretical virtue (for example, Boyd, 1990; Sober, 1994; Norton, 2003; Fitzpatrick, 2009). Hence, for any putative example of simplicity at work in the history of science, it is important to consider whether the relevant arguments are not best reconstructed in other terms (such a “deflationary” view of simplicity will be discussed further in Section 4c).

c. Simplicity and Inductive Inference

Many philosophers have come to see simplicity considerations figuring not only in how scientists go about evaluating and choosing between developed scientific theories, but also in the mechanics of making much more basic inductive inferences from empirical data. The standard illustration of this in the modern literature is the practice of curve-fitting. Suppose that we have a series of observations of the values of a variable, y, given values of another variable, x. This gives us a series of data points, as represented in Figure 1.

Figure 1

Given this data, what underlying relationship should we posit between x and y so that we can predict future pairs of x-y values? Standard practice is not to select a bumpy curve that neatly passes through all the data points, but rather to select a smooth curve—preferably a straight line, such as H1—that passes close to the data. But why do we do this? Part of an answer comes from the fact that if the data is to some degree contaminated with measurement error (for example, through mistakes in data collection) or “noise” produced by the effects of uncontrolled factors, then any curve that fits the data perfectly will most likely be false. However, this does not explain our preference for a curve like H1 over an infinite number of other curves—H2, for instance—that also pass close to the data. It is here that simplicity has been seen as playing a vital, though often implicit role in how we go about inferring hypotheses from empirical data: H1 posits a “simpler” relationship between x and y than H2—hence, it is for reasons of simplicity that we tend to infer hypotheses like H1.

The practice of curve-fitting has been taken to show that—whether we aware of it or not—human beings have a fundamental cognitive bias towards simple hypotheses. Whether we are deciding between rival scientific theories, or performing more basic generalizations from our experience, we ubiquitously tend to infer the simplest hypothesis consistent with our observations. Moreover, this bias is held to be necessary in order for us to be able select a unique hypotheses from the potentially limitless number of hypotheses consistent with any finite amount of experience.

The view that simplicity may often play an implicit role in empirical reasoning can arguably be traced back to David Hume’s description of enumerative induction in the context of his formulation of the famous problem of induction. Hume suggested that a tacit assumption of the uniformity of nature is ingrained into our psychology. Thus, we are naturally drawn to the conclusion that all ravens have black feathers from the fact that all previously observed ravens have black feathers because we tacitly assume that the world is broadly uniform in its properties. This has been seen as a kind of simplicity assumption: it is simpler to assume more of the same.

A fundamental link between simplicity and inductive reasoning has been retained in many more recent descriptive accounts of inductive inference. For instance, Hans Reichenbach (1949) described induction as an application of what he called the “Straight Rule”, modelling all inductive inference on curve-fitting. In addition, proponents of the model of “Inference to Best Explanation”, who hold that many inductive inferences are best understood as inferences to the hypothesis that would, if true, provide the best explanation for our observations, normally claim that simplicity is one of the criteria that we use to determine which hypothesis constitutes the “best” explanation.

In recent years, the putative role of simplicity in our inferential psychology has been attracting increasing attention from cognitive scientists. For instance, Lombrozo (2007) describes experiments that she claims show that participants use the relative simplicity of rival explanations (for instance, whether a particular medical diagnosis for a set of symptoms involves assuming the presence of one or multiple independent conditions) as a guide to assessing their probability, such that a disproportionate amount of contrary probabilistic evidence is required for participants to choose a more complex explanation over a simpler one. Simplicity considerations have also been seen as central to learning processes in many different cognitive domains, including language acquisition and category learning (for example, Chater, 1999; Lu and others, 2006).

d. Simplicity in Statistics and Data Analysis

Philosophers have long used the example of curve-fitting to illustrate the (often implicit) role played by considerations of simplicity in inductive reasoning from empirical data. However, partly due to the advent of low-cost computing power and that the fact scientists in many disciplines find themselves having to deal with ever larger and more intricate bodies of data, recent decades have seen a remarkable revolution in the methods available to scientists for analyzing and interpreting empirical data (Gauch, 2006). Importantly, there are now numerous formalized procedures for data analysis that can be implemented in computer software—and which are widely used in disciplines from engineering to crop science to sociology—that contain an explicit role for some notion of simplicity. The literature on such methods abounds with talk of “Ockham’s Razor”, “Occam factors”, “Ockham’s hill” (MacKay, 1992; Gauch, 2006), “Occam’s window” (Raftery and others, 1997), and so forth. This literature not only provides important illustrations of the role that simplicity plays in scientific practice, but may also offer insights for philosophers seeking to understand the basis for this role.

As an illustration, consider standard procedures for model selection, such as the Akaike Information Criterion (AIC), Bayesian Information Criterion (BIC), Minimum Message Length (MML) and Minimum Description Length (MDL) procedures, and numerous others (for discussion see, Forster and Sober, 1994; Forster, 2001; Gauch, 2003; Dowe and others, 2007). Model selection is a matter of selecting the kind of relationship that is to be posited between a set of variables, given a sample of data, in an effort to generate hypotheses about the true underlying relationship holding in the population of inference and/or to make predictions about future data. This question arises in the simple curve-fitting example discussed above—for instance, whether the true underlying relationship between x and y is linear, parabolic, quadratic, and so on. It also arises in lots of other contexts, such as the problem of inferring the causal relationship that exists between an empirical effect and a set of variables. “Models” in this sense are families of functions, such as the family of linear functions, LIN: y = a + bx, or the family of parabolic functions, PAR: y = a + bx + cx2. The simplicity of a model is normally explicated in terms of the number of adjustable parameters it contains (MML and MDL measure the simplicity of models in terms of the extent to which they provide compact descriptions of the data, but produce similar results to the counting of adjustable parameters). On this measure, the model LIN is simpler than PAR, since LIN contains two adjustable parameters, whereas PAR has three. A consequence of this is that a more complex model will always be able to fit a given sample of data better than a simpler model (“fitting” a model to the data involves using the data to determine what the values of the parameters in the model should be, given that data—that is, identifying the best-fitting member of the family). For instance, returning to the curve-fitting scenario represented in Figure 1, the best-fitting curve in PAR is guaranteed to fit this data set at least as well as the best-fitting member of the simpler model, LIN, and this is true no matter what the data are, since linear functions are special cases of parabolas, where c = 0, so any curve that is a member of LIN is also a member of PAR.

Model selection procedures produce a ranking of all the models under consideration in light of the data, thus allowing scientists to choose between them. Though they do it in different ways, AIC, BIC, MML, and MDL all implement procedures for model selection that impose a penalty on the complexity of a model, so that a more complex model will have to fit the data sample at hand significantly better than a simpler one for it to be rated higher than the simpler model. Often, this penalty is greater the smaller is the sample of data. Interestingly—and contrary to the assumptions of some philosophers—this seems to suggest that simplicity considerations do not only come into play as a tiebreaker between theories that fit the data equally well: according to the model selection literature, simplicity sometimes trumps better fit to the data. Hence, simplicity need not only come into play when all other things are equal.

Both statisticians and philosophers of statistics have vigorously debated the underlying justification for these sorts of model selection procedures (see, for example, the papers in Zellner and others, 2001). However, one motivation for taking into account the simplicity of models derives from a piece of practical wisdom: when there is error or “noise” in the data sample, a relatively simple model that fits the sample less well will often be more accurate when it comes to predicting extra-sample (for example, future) data than a more complex model that fits the sample more closely. The logic here is that since more complex models are more flexible in their ability to fit the data (since they have more adjustable parameters), they also have a greater propensity to be misled by errors and noise, in which case they may recover less of the true underlying “signal” in the sample. Thus, constraining model complexity may facilitate greater predictive accuracy. This idea is captured in what Gauch (2003, 2006) (following MacKay, 1992) calls “Ockham’s hill”. To the left of the peak of the hill, increasing the complexity of a model improves its accuracy with respect to extra-sample data because this recovers more of the signal in the sample. However, after the peak, increasing complexity actually diminishes predictive accuracy because this leads to over-fitting to spurious noise in the sample. There is therefore an optimal trade-off (at the peak of Ockham’s hill) between simplicity and fit to the sample data when it comes to facilitating accurate prediction of extra-sample data. Indeed, this trade-off is essentially the core idea behind AIC, the development of which initiated the now enormous literature on model selection, and the philosophers Malcolm Forster and Elliott Sober have sought to use such reasoning to make sense of the role of simplicity in many areas of science (see Section 4biii).

One important implication of this apparent link between model simplicity and predictive accuracy is that interpreting sample data using relatively simple models may improve the efficiency of experiments by allowing scientists to do more with less data—for example, scientists may be able to run a costly experiment fewer times before they can be in a position to make relatively accurate predictions about the future. Gauch (2003, 2006) describes several real world cases from crop science and elsewhere where this gain in accuracy and efficiency from the use of relatively simple models has been documented.

2. Wider Philosophical Significance of Issues Surrounding Simplicity

The putative role of simplicity, both in the evaluation of rival scientific theories and in the mechanics of how we go about inferring hypotheses from empirical data, clearly raises a number of difficult philosophical issues. These include, but are by no means limited to: (1) the question of what precisely it means to say the one theory or hypothesis is simpler than another and how the relative simplicity of theories is to be measured; (2) the question of what rational justification (if any) can be provided for choosing between rival theories on grounds of simplicity; and (3) the closely related question of what weight simplicity considerations ought to carry in theory choice relative to other theoretical virtues, particularly if these sometimes have to be traded-off against each other. (For general surveys of the philosophical literature on these issues, see Hesse, 1967; Sober, 2001a, 2001b). Before we delve more deeply into how philosophers have sought to answer these questions, it is worth noting the close connections between philosophical issues surrounding simplicity and many of the most important controversies in the philosophy of science and epistemology.

First, the problem of simplicity has close connections with long-standing issues surrounding the nature and justification of inductive inference. Some philosophers have actually offered up the idea that simpler theories are preferable to less simple ones as a purported solution to the problem of induction: it is the relative simplicity of the hypotheses that we tend to infer from empirical observations that supposedly provides the justification for these inferences—thus, it is simplicity that provides the warrant for our inductive practices. This approach is not as popular as it once was, since it is taken to merely substitute the problem of induction for the equally substantive problem of justifying preferences for simpler theories. A more common view in the recent literature is that the problem of induction and the problem of justifying preferences for simpler theories are closely connected, or may even amount to the same problem. Hence, a solution to the latter problem will provide substantial help towards solving the former.

More generally, the ability to make sense of the putative role of simplicity in scientific reasoning has been seen by many to be a central desideratum for any adequate philosophical theory of the scientific method. For example, Thomas Kuhn’s (1962) influential discussion of the importance of scientists’ aesthetic preferences—including but not limited to judgments of simplicity—in scientific revolutions was a central part of his case for adopting a richer conception of the scientific method and of theory change in science than he found in the dominant logical empiricist views of the time. More recently, critics of the Bayesian approach to scientific reasoning and theory confirmation, which holds that sound inductive reasoning is reasoning according to the formal principles of probability, have claimed that simplicity is an important feature of scientific reasoning that escapes a Bayesian analysis. For instance, Forster and Sober (1994) argue that Bayesian approaches to curve-fitting and model selection (such as the Bayesian Information Criterion) cannot themselves be given Bayesian rationale, nor can any other approach that builds in a bias towards simpler models. The ability of the Bayesian approach to make sense of simplicity in model selection and other aspects of scientific practice has thus been seen as central to evaluating its promise (see for example, Glymour, 1980; Forster and Sober, 1994; Forster, 1995; Kelly and Glymour, 2004; Howson and Urbach, 2006; Dowe and others, 2007).

Discussions over the legitimacy of simplicity as a criterion for theory choice have also been closely bound up with debates over scientific realism. Scientific realists assert that scientific theories aim to offer a literally true description of the world and that we have good reason to believe that the claims of our current best scientific theories are at least approximately true, including those claims that purport to be about “unobservable” natural phenomena that are beyond our direct perceptual access. Some anti-realists object that it is possible to formulate incompatible alternatives to our current best theories that are just as consistent with any current data that we have, perhaps even any future data that we could ever collect. They claim that we can therefore never be justified in asserting that the claims of our current best theories, especially those concerning unobservables, are true, or approximately true. A standard realist response is to emphasize the role of the so-called “theoretical virtues” in theory choice, among which simplicity is normally listed. The claim is thus that we rule out these alternative theories because they are unnecessarily complex. Importantly, for this defense to work, realists have to defend the idea that not only are we justified in choosing between rival theories on grounds of simplicity, but also that simplicity can be used as a guide to the truth. Naturally, anti-realists, particularly those of an empiricist persuasion (for example, van Fraassen, 1989), have expressed deep skepticism about the alleged truth-conduciveness of a simplicity criterion.

3. Defining and Measuring Simplicity

The first major philosophical problem that seems to arise from the notion that simplicity plays a role in theory choice and evaluation concerns specifying in more detail what it means to say that one theory is simpler than another and how the relative simplicity of theories is to be precisely and objectively measured. Numerous attempts have been made to formulate definitions and measures of theoretical simplicity, all of which face very significant challenges. Philosophers have not been the only ones to contribute to this endeavour. For instance, over the last few decades, a number of formal measures of simplicity and complexity have been developed in mathematical information theory. This section provides an overview of some of the main simplicity measures that have been proposed and the problems that they face. The proposals described here have also normally been tied to particular proposals about what justifies preferences for simpler theories. However, discussion of these justifications will be left until Section 4.

To begin with, it is worth considering why providing a precise definition and measure of theoretical simplicity ought to be regarded as a substantial philosophical problem. After all, it often seems that when one is confronted with a set of rival theories designed to explain a particular empirical phenomenon, it is just obvious which is the simplest. One does not always need a precise definition or measure of a particular property to be able to tell whether or not something exhibits it to a greater degree than something else. Hence, it could be suggested that if there is a philosophical problem here, it is only of very minor interest and certainly of little relevance to scientific practice. There are, however, some reasons to regard this as a substantial philosophical problem, which also has some practical relevance.

First, it is not always easy to tell whether one theory really ought to be regarded as simpler than another, and it is not uncommon for practicing scientists to disagree about the relative simplicity of rival theories. A well-known historical example is the disagreement between Galileo and Kepler concerning the relative simplicity of Copernicus’ theory of planetary motion, according to which the planets move only in perfect circular orbits with epicycles, and Kepler’s theory, according to which the planets move in elliptical orbits (see Holton, 1974; McAllister, 1996). Galileo held to the idea that perfect circular motion is simpler than elliptical motion. In contrast, Kepler emphasized that an elliptical model of planetary motion required many fewer orbits than a circular model and enabled a reduction of all the planetary motions to three fundamental laws of planetary motion. The problem here is that scientists seem to evaluate the simplicity of theories along a number of different dimensions that may conflict with each other. Hence, we have to deal with the fact that a theory may be regarded as simpler than a rival in one respect and more complex in another. To illustrate this further, consider the following list of commonly cited ways in which theories may be held to be simpler than others:

  • Quantitative ontological parsimony (or economy): postulating a smaller number of independent entities, processes, causes, or events.
  • Qualitative ontological parsimony (or economy): postulating a smaller number of independent kinds or classes of entities, processes, causes, or events.
  • Common cause explanation: accounting for phenomena in terms of common rather than separate causal processes.
  • Symmetry: postulating that equalities hold between interacting systems and that the laws describing the phenomena look the same from different perspectives.
  • Uniformity (or homogeneity): postulating a smaller number of changes in a given phenomenon and holding that the relations between phenomena are invariant.
  • Unification: explaining a wider and more diverse range of phenomena that might otherwise be thought to require separate explanations in a single theory (theoretical reduction is generally held to be a species of unification).
  • Lower level processes: when the kinds of processes that can be posited to explain a phenomena come in a hierarchy, positing processes that come lower rather than higher in this hierarchy.
  • Familiarity (or conservativeness): explaining new phenomena with minimal new theoretical machinery, reusing existing patterns of explanation.
  • Paucity of auxiliary assumptions: invoking fewer extraneous assumptions about the world.
  • Paucity of adjustable parameters: containing fewer independent parameters that the theory leaves to be determined by the data.

As can be seen from this list, there is considerable diversity here. We can see that theoretical simplicity is frequently thought of in ontological terms (for example, quantitative and qualitative parsimony), but also sometimes as a structural feature of theories (for example, unification, paucity of adjustable parameters), and while some of these intuitive types of simplicity may often cluster together in theories—for instance, qualitative parsimony would seem to often go together with invoking common cause explanations, which would in turn often seem to go together with explanatory unification—there is also considerable scope for them pointing in different directions in particular cases. For example, a theory that is qualitatively parsimonious as a result of positing fewer different kinds of entities might be quantitatively unparsimonious as result of positing more of a particular kind of entity; while the demand to explain in terms of lower-level processes rather than higher-level processes may conflict with the demand to explain in terms of common causes behind similar phenomena, and so on. There are also different possible ways of evaluating the simplicity of a theory with regard to any one of these intuitive types of simplicity. A theory may, for instance, come out as more quantitatively parsimonious than another if one focuses on the number of independent entities that it posits, but less parsimonious if one focuses on the number of independent causes it invokes. Consequently, it seems that if a simplicity criterion is actually to be applicable in practice, we need some way of resolving the disagreements that may arise between scientists about the relative simplicity of rival theories, and this requires a more precise measure of simplicity.

Second, as has already been mentioned, a considerable amount of the skepticism expressed both by philosophers and by scientists about the practice of choosing one theory over another on grounds of relative simplicity has stemmed from the suspicion that our simplicity judgments lack a principled basis (for example, Ackerman, 1961; Bunge, 1961; Priest, 1976). Disagreements between scientists, along with the multiplicity and scope for conflict between intuitive types of simplicity have been important contributors to this suspicion, leading to the view that for any two theories, T1 and T2, there is some way of evaluating their simplicity such that T1 comes out as simpler than T2, and vice versa. It seems, then, that an adequate defense of the legitimacy a simplicity criterion needs to show that there are in fact principled ways of determining when one theory is indeed simpler than another. Moreover, in so far as there is also a justificatory issue to be dealt with, we also need to be clear about exactly what it is that we need to justify a preference for.

a. Syntactic Measures

One proposal is that the simplicity of theories can be precisely and objectively measured in terms of how briefly they can be expressed. For example, a natural way of measuring the simplicity of an equation is just to count the number of terms, or parameters that it contains. Similarly, we could measure the simplicity of a theory in terms of the size of the vocabulary—for example, the number of extra-logical terms—required to write down its claims. Such measures of simplicity are often referred to as syntactic measures, since they involve counting the linguistic elements required to state, or to describe the theory.

A major problem facing any such syntactic measure of simplicity is the problem of language variance. A measure of simplicity is language variant if it delivers different results depending on the language that is used to represent the theories being compared. Suppose, for example, that we measure the simplicity of an equation by counting the number of non-logical terms that it contains. This will produce the result that r = a will come out as simpler than x2 + y2 = a2. However, this second equation is simply a transformation of the first into Cartesian co-ordinates, where r2 = x2 + y2, and is hence logically equivalent. The intuitive proposal for measuring simplicity in curve-fitting contexts, according to which hypotheses are said to be simpler if they contain fewer parameters, is also language variant in this sense. How many parameters a hypothesis contains depends on the co-ordinate scales that one uses. For any two non-identical functions, F and G, there is some way of transforming the co-ordinate scales such that we can turn F into a linear curve and G into a non-linear curve, and vice versa.

Nelson Goodman’s (1983) famous “new riddle of induction” allows us to formulate another example of the problem of language variance. Suppose all previously observed emeralds have been green. Now consider the following hypotheses about the color properties of the entire population of emeralds:

  • H1: all emeralds are green
  • H2: all emeralds first observed prior to time t are green and all emeralds first observed after time t are blue (where t is some future time)

Intuitively, H1 seems to be a simpler hypothesis than H2. To begin with, it can be stated with a smaller vocabulary. H1 also seems to postulate uniformity in the properties of emeralds, while H2 posits non-uniformity. For instance, H2 seems to assume that there is some link between the time at which an emerald is first observed and its properties. Thus it can be viewed as including an additional time parameter. But now consider Goodman’s invented predicates, “grue” and “bleen”. These have been defined in variety of different ways, but let us define them here as follows: an object is grue if it is first observed before time t and the object is green, or first observed after t and the object is blue; an object is bleen if it is first observed before time t and the object is blue, or first observed after the time t and the object is green. With these predicates, we can define a further property, “grolor”. Grue and bleen are grolors just as green and blue are colors. Now, because of the way that grolors are defined, color predicates like “green” and “blue” can also be defined in terms of grolor predicates: an object is green if first observed before time t and the object is grue, or first observed after time t and the object is bleen; an object is blue if first observed before time t and the object is bleen, or first observed after t and the object is grue. This means that statements that are expressed in terms of green and blue can also be expressed in terms of grue and bleen. So, we can rewrite H1 and H2 as follows:

  • H1: all emeralds first observed prior to time t are grue and all emeralds first observed after time t are bleen (where t is some future time)
  • H2: all emeralds are grue

Re-call that earlier we judged H1 to be simpler than H2. However, if we are retain that simplicity judgment, we cannot say that H1 is simpler than H2 because it can be stated with a smaller vocabulary; nor can we say that it H1 posits greater uniformity, and is hence simpler, because it does not contain a time parameter. This is because simplicity judgments based on such syntactic features can be reversed merely by switching the language used to represent the hypotheses from a color language to a grolor language.

Examples such as these have been taken to show two things. First, no syntactic measure of simplicity can suffice to produce a principled simplicity ordering, since all such measures will produce different results depending of the language of representation that is used. It is not enough just to stipulate that we should evaluate simplicity in one language rather than another, since that would not explain why simplicity should be measured in that way. In particular, we want to know that our chosen language is accurately tracking the objective language-independent simplicity of the theories being compared. Hence, if a syntactic measure of simplicity is to be used, say for practical purposes, it must be underwritten by a more fundamental theory of simplicity. Second, a plausible measure of simplicity cannot be entirely neutral with respect to all of the different claims about the world that the theory makes or can be interpreted as making. Because of the respective definitions of colors and grolors, any hypothesis that posits uniformity in color properties must posit non-uniformity in grolor properties. As Goodman emphasized, one can find uniformity anywhere if no restriction is placed on what kinds of properties should be taken into account. Similarly, it will not do to say that theories are simpler because they posit the existence of fewer entities, causes and processes, since, using Goodman-like manipulations, it is trivial to show that a theory can be regarded as positing any number of different entities, causes and processes. Hence, some principled restriction needs to be placed on which aspects of the content of a theory are to be taken into account and which are to be disregarded when measuring their relative simplicity.

b. Goodman’s Measure

According to Nelson Goodman, an important component of the problem of measuring the simplicity of scientific theories is the problem of measuring the degree of systematization that a theory imposes on the world, since, for Goodman, to seek simplicity is to seek a system. In a series of papers in the 1940s and 50s, Goodman (1943, 1955, 1958, 1959) attempted to explicate a precise measure of theoretical systematization in terms of the logical properties of the set of concepts, or extra-logical terms, that make up the statements of the theory.

According to Goodman, scientific theories can be regarded as sets of statements. These statements contain various extra-logical terms, including property terms, relation terms, and so on. These terms can all be assigned predicate symbols. Hence, all the statements of a theory can be expressed in a first order language, using standard symbolic notion. For instance, “… is acid” may become “A(x)”, “… is smaller than ____” may become “S(x, y)”, and so on. Goodman then claims that we can measure the simplicity of the system of predicates employed by the theory in terms of their logical properties, such as their arity, reflexivity, transitivity, symmetry, and so on. The details arehighly technical but, very roughly, Goodman’s proposal is that a system of predicates that can be used to express more is more complex than a system of predicates that can be used to express less. For instance, one of the axioms of Goodman’s proposal is that if every set of predicates of a relevant kind, K, is always replaceable by a set of predicates of another kind, L, then K is not more complex than L.

Part of Goodman’s project was to avoid the problem of language variance. Goodman’s measure is a linguistic measure, since it concerns measuring the simplicity of a theory’s predicate basis in a first order language. However, it is not a purely syntactic measure, since it does not involve merely counting linguistic elements, such as the number of extra-logical predicates. Rather, it can be regarded as an attempt to measure the richness of a conceptual scheme: conceptual schemes that can be used to say more are more complex than conceptual schemes that can be used to say less. Hence, a theory can be regarded as simpler if it requires a less expressive system of concepts.

Goodman developed his axiomatic measure of simplicity in considerable detail. However, Goodman himself only ever regarded it as a measure of one particular type of simplicity, since it only concerns the logical properties of the predicates employed by the theory. It does not, for example, take account of the number of entities that a theory postulates. Moreover, Goodman never showed how the measure could be applied to real scientific theories. It has been objected that even if Goodman’s measure could be applied, it would not discriminate between many theories that intuitively differ in simplicity—indeed, in the kind of simplicity as systematization that Goodman wants to measure. For instance, it is plausible that the system of concepts used to express the Copernican theory of planetary motion is just as expressively rich as the system of concepts used to express the Ptolemaic theory, yet the former is widely regarded as considerably simpler than the latter, partly in virtue of it providing an intuitively more systematic account of the data (for discussion of the details of Goodman’s proposal and the objections it faces, see Kemeny, 1955; Suppes, 1956; Kyburg, 1961; Hesse, 1967).

c. Simplicity as Testability

It has often been argued that simpler theories say more about the world and hence are easier to test than more complex ones. C. S. Peirce (1931), for example, claimed that the simplest theories are those whose empirical consequences are most readily deduced and compared with observation, so that they can be eliminated more easily if they are wrong. Complex theories, on the other hand, tend to be less precise and allow for more wriggle room in accommodating the data. This apparent connection between simplicity and testability has led some philosophers to attempt to formulate measures of simplicity in terms of the relative testability of theories.

Karl Popper (1959) famously proposed one such testability measure of simplicity. Popper associated simplicity with empirical content: simpler theories say more about the world than more complex theories and, in so doing, place more restriction on the ways that the world can be. According to Popper, the empirical content of theories, and hence their simplicity, can be measured in terms of their falsifiability. The falsifiability of a theory concerns the ease with which the theory can be proven false, if the theory is indeed false. Popper argued that this could be measured in terms of the amount of data that one would need to falsify the theory. For example, on Popper’s measure, the hypothesis that x and y are linearly related, according to an equation of the form, y = a + bx, comes out as having greater empirical content and hence greater simplicity than the hypotheses that they are related according a parabola of the form, y = a + bx + cx2. This is because one only needs three data points to falsify the linear hypothesis, but one needs at least four data points to falsify the parabolic hypothesis. Thus Popper argued that empirical content, falsifiability, and hence simplicity, could be seen as equivalent to the paucity of adjustable parameters. John Kemeny (1955) proposed a similar testability measure, according to which theories are more complex if they can come out as true in more ways in an n-member universe, where n is the number of individuals that the universe contains.

Popper’s equation of simplicity with falsifiability suffers from some serious objections. First, it cannot be applied to comparisons between theories that make equally precise claims, such as a comparison between a specific parabolic hypothesis and a specific linear hypothesis, both of which specify precise values for their parameters and can be falsified by only one data point. It also cannot be applied when we compare theories that make probabilistic claims about the world, since probabilistic statements are not strictly falsifiable. This is particularly troublesome when it comes to accounting for the role of simplicity in the practice of curve-fitting, since one normally has to deal with the possibility of error in the data. As a result, an error distribution is normally added to the hypotheses under consideration, so that they are understood as conferring certain probabilities on the data, rather than as having deductive observational consequences. In addition, most philosophers of science now tend to think that falsifiability is not really an intrinsic property of theories themselves, but rather a feature of how scientists are disposed to behave towards their theories. Even deterministic theories normally do not entail particular observational consequences unless they are conjoined with particular auxiliary assumptions, usually leaving the scientist the option of saving the theory from refutation by tinkering with their auxiliary assumptions—a point famously emphasized by Pierre Duhem (1954). This makes it extremely difficult to maintain that simpler theories are intrinsically more falsifiable than less simple ones. Goodman (1961, p150-151) also argued that equating simplicity with falsifiability leads to counter-intuitive consequences. The hypothesis, “All maple trees are deciduous”, is intuitively simpler than the hypothesis, “All maple trees whatsoever, and all sassafras trees in Eagleville, are deciduous”, yet, according to Goodman, the latter hypothesis is clearly the easiest to falsify of the two. Kemeny’s measure inherits many of the same objections.

Both Popper and Kemeny essentially tried to link the simplicity of a theory with the degree to which it can accommodate potential future data: simpler theories are less accommodating than more complex ones. One interesting recent attempt to make sense of this notion of accommodation is due to Harman and Kulkarni (2007). Harman and Kulkarni analyze accommodation in terms of a concept drawn from statistical learning theory known as the Vapnik-Chervonenkis (VC) dimension. The VC dimension of a hypothesis can be roughly understood as a measure of the “richness” of the class of hypotheses from which it is drawn, where a class is richer if it is harder to find data that is inconsistent with some member of the class. Thus, a hypothesis drawn from a class that can fit any possible set of data will have infinite VC dimension. Though VC dimension shares some important similarities with Popper’s measure, there are important differences. Unlike Popper’s measure, it implies that accommodation is not always equivalent to the number of adjustable parameters. If we count adjustable parameters, sine curves of the form y = a sin bx, come out as relatively unaccommodating, however, such curves have an infinite VC dimension. While Harman and Kulkarni do not propose that VC dimension be taken as a general measure of simplicity (in fact, they regard it as an alternative to simplicity in some scientific contexts), ideas along these lines might perhaps hold some future promise for testability/accommodation measures of simplicity. Similar notions of accommodation in terms of “dimension” have been used to explicate the notion of the simplicity of a statistical model in the face of the fact the number of adjustable parameters a model contains is language variant (for discussion, see Forster, 1999; Sober, 2007).

d. Sober’s Measure

In his early work on simplicity, Elliott Sober (1975) proposed that the simplicity of theories be measured in terms of their question-relative informativeness. According to Sober, a theory is more informative if it requires less supplementary information from us in order for us to be able to use it to determine the answer to the particular questions that we are interested in. For instance, the hypothesis, y = 4x, is more informative and hence simpler than y = 2z + 2x with respect to the question, “what is the value of y?” This is because in order to find out the value of y one only needs to determine a value for x on the first hypothesis, whereas on the second hypothesis one also needs to determine a value for z. Similarly, Sober’s proposal can be used to capture the intuition that theories that say that a given class of things are uniform in their properties are simpler than theories that say that the class is non-uniform, because they are more informative relative to particular questions about the properties of the class. For instance, the hypothesis that “all ravens are black” is more informative and hence simpler than “70% of ravens are black” with respect to the question, “what will be the colour of the next observed raven?” This is because on the former hypothesis one needs no additional information in order to answer this question, whereas one will have to supplement the latter hypothesis with considerable extra information in order to generate a determinate answer.

By relativizing the notion of the content-fullness of theories to the question that one is interested in, Sober’s measure avoids the problem that Popper and Kemeny’s proposals faced of the most arbitrarily specific theories, or theories made up of strings of irrelevant conjunctions of claims, turning out to be the simplest. Moreover, according to Sober’s proposal, the content of the theory must be relevant to answering the question for it to count towards the theory’s simplicity. This gives rise to the most distinctive element of Sober’s proposal: different simplicity orderings of theories will be produced depending on the question one asks. For instance, if we want to know what the relationship is between values of z and given values of y and x, then y = 2z + 2x will be more informative, and hence simpler, than y = 4x. Thus, a theory can be simple relative to some questions and complex relative to others.

Critics have argued that Sober’s measure produces a number of counter-intuitive results. Firstly, the measure cannot explain why people tend to judge an equation such as y = 3x + 4x2 – 50 as more complex than an equation like y = 2x, relative to the question, “what is the value of y?” In both cases, one only needs a value of x to work out a value for y. Similarly, Sober’s measure fails to deal with Goodman’s above cited counter-example to the idea that simplicity equates to testability, since it produces the counter-intuitive outcome that there is no difference in simplicity between “all maple trees whatsoever, and all sassafras trees in Eagleville, are deciduous” and “all maple trees are deciduous” relative to questions about whether maple trees are deciduous. The interest-relativity of Sober’s measure has also generated criticism from those who prefer to see simplicity as a property that varies only with what a given theory is being compared with, not with the question that one happens to be asking.

e. Thagard’s Measure

Paul Thagard (1988) proposed that simplicity ought to be understood as a ratio of the number of facts explained by a theory to the number of auxiliary assumptions that the theory requires. Thagard defines an auxiliary assumption as a statement, not part of the original theory, which is assumed in order for the theory to be able to explain one or more of the facts to be explained. Simplicity is then measured as follows:

  • Simplicity of T = (Facts explained by T – Auxiliary assumptions of T) / Facts explained by T

A value of 0 is given to a maximally complex theory that requires as many auxiliary assumptions as facts that it explains and 1 to a maximally simple theory that requires no auxiliary assumptions at all to explain. Thus, the higher the ratio of facts explained to auxiliary assumptions, the simpler the theory. The essence of Thagard’s proposal is that we want to explain as much as we can, while making the fewest assumptions about the way the world is. By balancing the paucity of auxiliary assumptions against explanatory power it prevents the unfortunate consequence of the simplest theories turning out to be those that are most anaemic.

A significant difficulty facing Thargard’s proposal lies in determining what the auxiliary assumptions of theories actually are and how to count them. It could be argued that the problem of counting auxiliary assumptions threatens to become as difficult as the original problem of measuring simplicity. What a theory must assume about the world for it to explain the evidence is frequently extremely unclear and even harder to quantify. In addition, some auxiliary assumptions are bigger and more onerous than others and it is not clear that they should be given equal weighting, as they are in Thagard’s measure. Another objection is that Thagard’s proposal struggles to make sense of things like ontological parsimony—the idea that theories are simpler because they posit fewer things—since it is not clear that parsimony per se would make any particular difference to the number of auxiliary assumptions required. In defense of this, Thagard has argued that ontological parsimony is actually less important to practicing scientists than has often been thought.

f. Information-Theoretic Measures

Over the last few decades, a number of formal measures of simplicity and complexity have been developed in mathematical information theory. Though many of these measures have been designed for addressing specific practical problems, the central ideas behind them have been claimed to have significance for addressing the philosophical problem of measuring the simplicity of scientific theories.

One of the prominent information-theoretic measures of simplicity in the current literature is Kolmogorov complexity, which is a formal measure of quantitative information content (see Li and Vitányi, 1997). The Kolmogorov complexity K(x) of an object x is the length in bits of the shortest binary program that can output a completely faithful description of x in some universal programming language, such as LISP or PASCALL. This measure was originally formulated to measure randomness in data strings (such as sequences of numbers), and is based on the insight that non-random data strings can be “compressed” by finding the patterns that exist in them. If there are patterns in a data string, it is possible to provide a completely accurate description of it that is shorter than the string itself, in terms of the number of “bits” of information used in the description, by using the pattern as a mnemonic that eliminates redundant information that need not be encoded in the description. For instance, if the data string is an ordered sequence of 1s and 0s, where every 1 is followed by a 0, and every 0 by a 1, then it can be given a very short description that specifies the pattern, the value of the first data point and the number of data points. Any further information is redundant. Completely random data sets, however, contain no patterns, no redundancy, and hence are not compressible.

It has been argued that Kolmogorov complexity can be applied as a general measure of the simplicity of scientific theories. Theories can be thought of as specifying the patterns that exist in the data sets they are meant to explain. As a result, we can also think of theories as compressing the data. Accordingly, the more a theory T compresses the data, the lower the value of K for the data using T, and the greater is its simplicity. An important feature of Kolmogorov complexity is that simplicity is measured in a universal programming language and universal programming languages are asymptotically equivalent up to a constant. This means that the difference in code length between the shortest code length for x in one universal programming language and the shortest code length for x in another programming language is a function of a constant c, not of x. Hence, for any program the difference between its shortest code length in one programming language and its shortest code length in another will be the same. This, in turn, means that Kolmogorov complexity measurement is language invariant in the sense that the values of K(x) for different objects can be compared no matter what universal programming language K(x) is measured in. And, by definition, anything that can be expressed in some language can be expressed in a universal programming language. Due to this, along with its generality and mathematical precision, some enthusiasts have claimed that Kolmogorov complexity solves the problem of defining and measuring simplicity.

A number of objections have been raised against this application of Kolmogorov complexity. First, finding K(x) is a non-computable problem: no algorithm exists to compute it. This is claimed to be a serious practical limitation of the measure. Another objection is that Kolmogorov complexity produces some counter-intuitive results. For instance, theories that make probabilistic rather than deterministic predictions about the data must have maximum Kolmogorov complexity. For example, a theory that says that a sequence of coin flips conforms to the probabilistic law, Pr(Heads) = ½, cannot be said to compress the data, since one cannot use this law to reconstruct the exact sequence of heads and tails, even though it offers an intuitively simple explanation of what we observe.

Other information-theoretic measures of simplicity, such as the Minimum Message Length (MML) and Minimum Description Length (MDL) measures, avoid some of the practical problems facing Kolmogorov Complexity. Though there are important differences in the details of these measures (see Wallace and Dowe, 1999), they all adopt the same basic idea that the simplicity of an empirical hypothesis can be measured in terms of the extent to which it provides a compact encoding of the data.

A general objection to all such measures of simplicity is that scientific theories generally aim to do more than specify patterns in the data. They also aim to explain why these patterns are there and it is in relation to how theories go about explaining the patterns in our observations that theories have often been thought to be simple or complex. Hence, it can be argued that mere data compression cannot, by itself, suffice as an explication of simplicity in relation to scientific theories. A further objection to the data compression approach is that theories can be viewed as compressing data sets in a very large number of different ways, many of which we do not consider appropriate contributions to simplicity. The problem raised by Goodman’s new riddle of induction can be seen as the problem of deciding which regularities to measure: for example, color regularities or grolor regularities? Formal information-theoretical measures do not discriminate between different kinds of pattern finding. Hence, any such measure can only be applied once we specify the sorts of patterns and regularities that should be taken into account.

g. Is Simplicity a Unified Concept?

There is a general consensus in the philosophical literature that the project of articulating a precise general measure of theoretical simplicity faces very significant challenges. Of course, this has not stopped practicing scientists from utilizing notions of simplicity in their work, and particular concepts of simplicity—such as the simplicity of a statistical model, understood in terms of paucity of adjustable parameters or model dimension—are firmly entrenched in several areas of science. Given this, one potential way of responding to the difficulties that philosophers and others have encountered in this area—particularly in light of the apparent multiplicity and scope for conflict between intuitive explications of simplicity—is to raise the question of whether theoretical simplicity is in fact a unified concept at all. Perhaps there is no single notion of simplicity that is (or should be) employed by scientists, but rather a cluster of different, sometimes related, but also sometimes conflicting notions of simplicity that scientists find useful to varying degrees in particular contexts. This might be evidenced by the observation that scientists’ simplicity judgments often involve making trade-offs between different notions of simplicity. Kepler’s preference for an astronomical theory that abandoned perfectly circular motions for the planets, but which could offer a unified explanation of the astronomical observations in terms of three basic laws, over a theory that retained perfect circular motion, but could not offer a similarly unified explanation, seems to be a clear example of this.

As a result of thoughts in this sort of direction, some philosophers have argued that there is actually no single theoretical value here at all, but rather a cluster of them (for example, Bunge, 1961). It is also worth considering the possibility that which of the cluster is accorded greater weight than the others, and how each of them is understood in practice, may vary greatly across different disciplines and fields of inquiry. Thus, what really matters when it comes to evaluating the comparative “simplicity” of theories might be quite different for biologists than for physicists, for instance, and perhaps what matters to a particle physicist is different to what matters to an astrophysicist. If there is in fact no unified concept of simplicity at work in science that might also indicate that there is no unitary justification for choosing between rival theories on grounds of simplicity. One important suggestion that this possibility has lead to is that the role of simplicity in science cannot be understood from a global perspective, but can only be understood locally. How simplicity ought to be measured and why it matters may have a peculiarly domain-specific explanation.

4. Justifying Preferences for Simpler Theories

Due to the apparent centrality of simplicity considerations to scientific methods and the link between it and numerous other important philosophical issues, the problem of justifying preferences for simpler theories is regarded as a major problem in the philosophy of science. It is also regarded as one of the most intractable. Though an extremely wide variety of justifications have been proposed—as with the debate over how to correctly define and measure simplicity, some important recent contributions have their origins in scientific literature in statistics, information theory, and other cognate fields—all of them have met with significant objections. There is currently no agreement amongst philosophers on what is the most promising path to take. There is also skepticism in some circles about whether an adequate justification is even possible.

Broadly speaking, justificatory proposals can be categorized into three types: 1) accounts that seek to show that simplicity is an indicator of truth (that is, that simpler theories are, in general, more likely to be true, or are somehow better confirmed by the empirical data than their more complex rivals); 2) accounts that do not regard simplicity as a direct indicator of truth, but which seek to highlight some alternative methodological justification for preferring simpler theories; 3) deflationary approaches, which actually reject the idea that there is a general justification for preferring simpler theories per se, but which seek to analyze particular appeals to simplicity in science in terms of other, less problematic, theoretical virtues.

a. Simplicity as an Indicator of Truth

i. Nature is Simple

Historically, the dominant view about why we should prefer simpler theories to more complex ones has been based on a general metaphysical thesis of the simplicity of nature. Since nature itself is simple, the relative simplicity of theories can thus be regarded as direct evidence for their truth. Such a view was explicitly endorsed by many of the great scientists of the past, including Aristotle, Copernicus, Galileo, Kepler, Newton, Maxwell, and Einstein. Naturally however, the question arises as to what justifies the thesis that nature is simple? Broadly speaking, there have been two different sorts of argument given for this thesis: i) that a benevolent God must have created a simple and elegant universe; ii) that the past record of success of relatively simple theories entitles us to infer that nature is simple. The theological justification was most common amongst scientists and philosophers during the early modern period. Einstein, on the other hand, invoked a meta-inductive justification, claiming that the history of physics justifies us in believing that nature is the realization of the simplest conceivable mathematical ideas.

Despite the historical popularity and influence of this view, more recent philosophers and scientists have been extremely resistant to the idea that we are justified in believing that nature is simple. For a start, it seems difficult to formulate the thesis that nature is simple so that it is not either obviously false, or too vague to be of any use. There would seem to be many counter-examples to the claim that we live in a simple universe. Consider, for instance, the picture of the atomic nucleus that physicists were working with in the early part of the twentieth century: it was assumed that matter was made only of protons and electrons; there were no such things as neutrons or neutrinos and no weak or strong nuclear forces to be explained, only electromagnetism. Subsequent discoveries have arguably led to a much more complex picture of nature and much more complex theories have had to be developed to account for this. In response, it could be claimed that though nature seems to be complex in some superficial respects, there is in fact a deep underlying simplicity in the fundamental structure of nature. It might also be claimed that the respects in which nature appears to be complex are necessary consequences of its underlying simplicity. But this just serves to highlight the vagueness of the claim that nature is simple—what exactly does this thesis amount to, and what kind of evidence could we have for it?

However the thesis is formulated, it would seem to be an extremely difficult one to adequately defend, whether this be on theological or meta-inductive grounds. An attempt to give a theological justification for the claim that nature is simple suffers from an inherent unattractiveness to modern philosophers and scientists who do not want to ground the legitimacy of scientific methods in theology. In any case, many theologians reject the supposed link between God’s benevolence and the simplicity of creation. With respect to a meta-inductive justification, even if it were the case that the history of science demonstrates the better than average success of simpler theories, we may still raise significant worries about the extent to which this could give sufficient credence to the claim that nature is simple. First, it assumes that empirical success can be taken to be a reliable indicator of truth (or at least approximate truth), and hence of what nature is really like. Though this is a standard assumption for many scientific realists—the claim being that success would be “miraculous” if the theory concerned was radically false—it is a highly contentious one, since many anti-realists hold that the history of science shows that all theories, even eminently successful theories, typically turn out to be radically false. Even if one does accept a link between success and truth, our successes to date may still not provide a representative sample of nature: maybe we have only looked at the problems that are most amenable to simple solutions and the real underlying complexity of nature has escaped our notice. We can also question the degree to which we can extrapolate any putative connection between simplicity and truth in one area of nature to nature as a whole. Moreover, in so far as simplicity considerations are held to be fundamental to inductive inference quite generally, such an attempted justification risks a charge of circularity.

ii. Meta-Inductive Proposals

There is another way of appealing to past success in order to try to justify a link between simplicity and truth. Instead of trying to justify a completely general claim about the simplicity of nature, this proposal merely suggests that we can infer a correlation between success and very particular simplicity characteristics in particular fields of inquiry—for instance, a particular kind of symmetry in certain areas of theoretical physics. If success can be regarded as an indicator of at least approximate truth, we can then infer that theories that are simpler in the relevant sense are more likely to be true in fields where the correlation with success holds.

Recent examples of this sort of proposal include McAllister (1996) and Kuipers (2002). In an effort to account for the truth-conduciveness of aesthetic considerations in science, including simplicity, Theo Kuipers (2002) claims that scientists tend to become attracted to theories that share particular aesthetic features in common with successful theories that they have been previously exposed to. In other words, we can explain the particular aesthetic preferences that scientists have in terms that are similar to a well-documented psychological effect known as the “mere-exposure effect”, which occurs when individuals take a liking to something after repeated exposure to it. If, in a given field of inquiry, theories that have been especially successful exhibit a particular type of simplicity (however this is understood), and thus such theories have been repeatedly presented to scientists working in the field during their training, the mere-exposure effect will then lead these scientists to be attracted to other theories that also exhibit that same type of simplicity. This process can then be used to support an aesthetic induction to a correlation between simplicity in the relevant sense and success. One can then make a case that this type of simplicity can legitimately be taken as an indicator of at least approximate truth.

Even though this sort of meta-inductive proposal does not attempt to show that nature in general is simple, many of the same objections can be raised against it as are raised against the attempt to justify that metaphysical thesis by appeal to the past success of simple theories. Once again, there is the problem of justifying the claim that empirical success is a reliable guide to (approximate) truth. Kuipers’ own arguments for this claim rest on a somewhat idiosyncratic account of truth approximation. In addition, in order to legitimately infer that there is a genuine correlation between simplicity and success, one cannot just look at successful theories; one must look at unsuccessful theories too. Even if all the successful theories in a domain have the relevant simplicity characteristic, it might still be the case that the majority of theories with the characteristic have been (or would have been) highly unsuccessful. Indeed, if one can potentially modify a successful theory in an infinite number of ways while keeping the relevant simplicity characteristic, one might actually be able to guarantee that the majority of possible theories with the characteristic would be unsuccessful theories, thus breaking the correlation between simplicity and success. This could be taken as suggesting that in order to carry any weight, arguments from success also need to offer an explanation for why simplicity contributes to success. Moreover, though the mere-exposure effect is well documented, Kuipers provides no direct empirical evidence that scientists actually acquire their aesthetic preferences via the kind of process that he proposes.

iii. Bayesian Proposals

According to standard varieties of Bayesianism, we should evaluate scientific theories according to their probability conditional upon the evidence (posterior probability). This probability, Pr(T | E), is a function of three quantities:

  • Pr(T | E) = Pr(E | T) Pr(T) / Pr(E)

Pr(E | T), is the probability that the theory, T, confers on the evidence, E, which is referred to as the likelihood of T. Pr(T) is the prior probability of T, and Pr(E) is the probability of E. T is then held to have higher posterior probability than a rival theory, T*, if and only if:

  • Pr(E | T) Pr(T) > Pr(E | T*) Pr(T*)

A standard Bayesian proposal for understanding the role of simplicity in theory choice is that simplicity is one of the key determinates of Pr(T): other things being equal, simpler theories and hypotheses are held to have higher prior probability of being true than more complex ones. Thus, if two rival theories confer equal or near equal probability on the data, but differ in relative simplicity, other things being equal, the simpler theory will tend to have a higher posterior probability. This idea, which Harold Jeffreys called “the simplicity postulate”, has been elaborated in a number of different ways by philosophers, statisticians, and information theorists, utilizing various measures of simplicity (for example, Carnap, 1950; Jeffreys, 1957, 1961; Solomonoff, 1964; Li, M. and Vitányi, 1997).

In response to this proposal, Karl Popper (1959) argued that, in some cases, assigning a simpler theory a higher prior probability actually violates the axioms of probability. For instance, Jeffreys proposed that simplicity be measured by counting adjustable parameters. On this measure, the claim that the planets move in circular orbits is simpler than the claim that the planets move in elliptical orbits, since the equation for an ellipse contains an additional adjustable parameter. However, circles can also be viewed as special cases of ellipses, where the additional parameter is set to zero. Hence, the claim that planets move in circular orbits can also be seen as a special case of the claim that the planets move in elliptical orbits. If that is right, then the former claim cannot be more probable than the latter claim because the truth of the former entails the truth of latter and probability respects entailment. In reply to Popper, it has been argued that this prior probabilistic bias towards simpler theories should only be seen as applying to comparisons between inconsistent theories where no relation of entailment holds between them—for instance, between the claim that the planets move in circular orbits and the claim that they move in elliptical but non-circular orbits.

The main objection to the Bayesian proposal that simplicity is a determinate of prior probability is that the theory of probability seems to offer no resources for explaining why simpler theories should be accorded higher prior probability. Rudolf Carnap (1950) thought that prior probabilities could be assigned a priori to any hypothesis stated in a formal language, on the basis of a logical analysis of the structure of the language and assumptions about the equi-probability of all possible states of affairs. However, Carnap’s approach has generally been recognized to be unworkable. If higher prior probabilities cannot be assigned to simpler theories on the basis of purely logical or mathematical considerations, then it seems that Bayesians must look outside of the Bayesian framework itself to justify the simplicity postulate.

Some Bayesians have taken an alternative route, claiming that a direct mathematical connection can be established between the simplicity of theories and their likelihood—that is, the value of Pr(E | T) ( see Rosencrantz, 1983; Myrvold, 2003; White, 2005). This proposal depends on the assumption that simpler theories have fewer adjustable parameters, and hence are consistent with a narrower range of potential data. Suppose that we collect a set of empirical data, E, that can be explained by two theories that differ with respect to this kind of simplicity: a simple theory, S, and a complex theory, C. S has no adjustable parameters and only ever entails E, while C has an adjustable parameter, θ, which can take a range of values, n. When θ is set to some specific value, i, it entails E, but on other values of θ, C entails different and incompatible observations. It is then argued that S confers a higher probability on E. This is because C allows that lots of other possible observations could have been made instead of E (on different possible settings for θ). Hence, the truth of C would make our recording those particular observations less probable than would the truth of S. Here, the likelihood of C is calculated as the average of the likelihoods of each of the n versions of C, defined by a unique setting of θ. Thus, as the complexity of a theory increases—measured in terms of the number of adjustable parameters it contains—the number of versions of the theory that will give a low probability to E will increase and the overall value of Pr(E | T) will go down.

An objection to this proposal (Kelly, 2004, 2010) is that for us to be able to show that S has a higher posterior probability than C as a result of its having a higher likelihood, it must be assumed that the prior probability of C is not significantly greater than the prior probability of S. This is a substantive assumption to make because of the way that simplicity is defined in this argument. We can view C as coming in a variety of different versions, each of which is picked out by a different value given to θ. If we then assume that S and C have roughly equal prior probability we must, by implication, assume that each version of C has a very low prior probability compared to S, since the prior probability of each version of C would be Pr(C) / n (assuming that the theory does not say that any particular parameter setting is more probable than any of the others). This would effectively build in a very strong prior bias in favour of S over each version of C. Given that each version of C could be considered independently—that is, the complex theory could be given a simpler, more restricted formulation—this would require an additional supporting argument. The objection is thus that the proposal simply begs the question by resting on a prior probabilistic bias towards simpler theories. Another objection is that the proposal suffers from the limitation that it can only be applied to comparisons between theories where the simpler theory can be derived from the more complex one by fixing certain of its parameters. At best, this represents a small fraction of cases in which simplicity has been thought to play a role.

iv. Simplicity as a Fundamental A Priori Principle

In the light of the perceived failure of philosophers to justify the claim that simpler theories are more likely to true, Richard Swinburne (2001) has argued that this claim has to be regarded as a fundamental a priori principle. Swinburne argues that it is just obvious that the criteria for theory evaluation that scientists use reliably lead them to make correct judgments about which theories are more likely to true. Since, Swinburne argues, one of these is that simpler theories are, other things being equal, more likely to be true, we just have to accept that simplicity is indeed an indicator of probable truth. However, Swinburne doesn’t think that this connection between simplicity and truth can be established empirically, nor does he think that it can be shown to follow from some more obvious a priori principle. Hence, we have no choice but to regard it as a fundamental a priori principle—a principle that cannot be justified by anything more fundamental.

In response to Swinburne, it can be argued that this is hardly going to convince those scientists and philosophers for whom it is not at all obvious the simpler theories are more likely to be true.

b. Alternative Justifications

i. Falsifiability

Famously, Karl Popper (1959) rejected the idea that theories are ever confirmed by evidence and that we are ever entitled to regard a theory as true, or probably true. Hence, Popper did not think simplicity could be legitimately regarded as an indicator of truth. Rather, he argued that simpler theories are to be valued because they are more falsifiable. Indeed, Popper thought that the simplicity of theories could be measured in terms of their falsifiability, since intuitively simpler theories have greater empirical content, placing more restriction on the ways the world can be, thus leading to a reduced ability to accommodate any future that we might discover. According to Popper, scientific progress consists not in the attainment of true theories, but in the elimination of false ones. Thus, the reason we should prefer more falsifiable theories is because such theories will be more quickly eliminated if they are in fact false. Hence, the practice of first considering the simplest theory consistent with the data provides a faster route to scientific progress. Importantly, for Popper, this meant that we should prefer simpler theories because they have a lower probability of being true, since, for any set of data, it is more likely that some complex theory (in Popper’s sense) will be able to accommodate it than a simpler theory.

Popper’s equation of simplicity with falsifiability suffers from some well-known objections and counter-examples, and these pose significant problems for his justificatory proposal (Section 3c). Another significant problem is that taking degree of falsifiability as a criterion for theory choice seems to lead to absurd consequences, since it encourages us to prefer absurdly specific scientific theories to those that have more general content. For instance, the hypothesis, “all emeralds are green until 11pm today when they will turn blue” should be judged as preferable to “all emeralds are green” because it is easier to falsify. It thus seems deeply implausible to say that selecting and testing such hypotheses first provides the fastest route to scientific progress.

ii. Simplicity as an Explanatory Virtue

A number of philosophers have sought to elucidate the rationale for preferring simpler theories to more complex ones in explanatory terms (for example, Friedman, 1974; Sober, 1975; Walsh, 1979; Thagard, 1988; Kitcher, 1989; Baker, 2003). These proposals have typically been made on the back of accounts of scientific explanation that explicate notions of explanatoriness and explanatory power in terms of unification, which is taken to be intimately bound up with notions of simplicity. According to unification accounts of explanation, a theory is explanatory if it shows how different phenomena are related to each other under certain systematizing theoretical principles, and a theory is held to have greater explanatory power than its rivals if it systematizes more phenomena. For Michael Friedman (1974), for instance, explanatory power is a function of the number of independent phenomena that we need to accept as ultimate: the smaller the number of independent phenomena that are regarded as ultimate by the theory, the more explanatory is the theory. Similarly, for Philip Kitcher (1989), explanatory power is increased the smaller the number of patterns of argument, or “problem-solving schemas”, that are needed to deliver the facts about the world that we accept. Thus, on such accounts, explanatory power is seen as a structural relationship between the sparseness of an explanation—the fewness of hypotheses or argument patterns—and the plenitude of facts that are explained. There have been various attempts to explicate notions of simplicity in terms of these sorts of features. A standard type of argument that is then used is that we want our theories not only to be true, but also explanatory. If truth were our only goal, there would be no reason to prefer a genuine scientific theory to a collection of random factual statements that all happen to be true. Hence, explanation is an ultimate, rather than a purely instrumental goal of scientific inquiry. Thus, we can justify our preferences for simpler theories once we recognize that there is a fundamental link between simplicity and explanatoriness and that explanation is a key goal of scientific inquiry, alongside truth.

There are some well-known objections to unification theories of explanation, though most of them concern the claim that unification is all there is to explanation—a claim on which the current proposal does not depend. However, even if we accept a unification theory of explanation and accept that explanation is an ultimate goal of scientific inquiry, it can be objected that the choice between a simple theory and a more complex rival is not normally a choice between a theory that is genuinely explanatory, in this sense, and a mere factual report. The complex theory can normally be seen as unifying different phenomena under systematizing principles, at least to some degree. Hence, the justificatory question here is not about why we should prefer theories that explain the data to theories that do not, but why we should prefer theories that have greater explanatory power in the senses just described to theories that are comparatively less explanatory. It is certainly a coherent possibility that the truth may turn out to be relatively disunified and unsystematic. Given this, it seems appropriate to ask why we are justified in choosing theories because they are more unifying. Just saying that explanation is an ultimate goal of scientific inquiry does not seem to be enough.

iii. Predictive Accuracy

In the last few decades, the treatment of simplicity as an explicit part of statistical methodology has become increasingly sophisticated. A consequence of this is that some philosophers of science have started looking to the statistics literature for illumination on how to think about the philosophical problems surrounding simplicity. According to Malcolm Forster and Elliott Sober (Forster and Sober, 1994; Forster, 2001; Sober, 2007), the work of the statistician, Hirotugu Akaike (1973), provides a precise theoretical framework for understanding the justification for the role of simplicity in curve-fitting and model selection.

Standard approaches to curve-fitting effect a trade-off between fit to a sample of data and the simplicity of the kind of mathematical relationship that is posited to hold between the variables—that is, the simplicity of the postulated model for the underlying relationship, typically measured in terms of the number of adjustable parameters it contains. This often means, for instance, that a linear hypothesis that fits a sample of data less well may be chosen over a parabolic hypothesis that fits the data better. According to Forster and Sober, Akaike developed an explanation for why it is rational to favor simpler models, under specific circumstances. The proposal builds on the practical wisdom that when there is a particular amount of error or noise in the data sample, more complex models have a greater propensity to “over-fit” to this spurious data in the sample and thus lead to less accurate predictions of extra-sample (for instance, future) data, particularly when dealing with small sample sizes. (Gauch [2003, 2006] calls this “Ockham’s hill”: to the left of the peak of the hill, increasing the complexity of a model improves its accuracy with respect to extra-sample data; after the peak, increasing complexity actually diminishes predictive accuracy. There is therefore an optimal trade-off at the peak of Ockham’s hill between simplicity and fit to the data sample when it comes to facilitating accurate prediction). According to Forster and Sober, what Akaike did was prove a theorem, which shows that, given standard statistical assumptions, we can estimate the degree to which constraining model complexity when fitting a curve to a sample of data will lead to more accurate predictions of extra-sample data. Following Forster and Sober’s presentation (1994, p9-10), Akaike’s theorem can be stated as follows:

  • Estimated[A(M)] = (1/N)[log-likelihood(L(M)) – k],

where A(M) is the predictive accuracy of the model, M, with respect to extra-sample data, N is the number of data points in the sample, log-likelihood is a measure of goodness of fit to the sample (the higher the log-likelihood score the closer the fit to the data), L(M) is the best fitting member of M, and k is the number of adjustable parameters that M contains. Akaike’s theorem is claimed to specify an unbiased estimator of predictive accuracy, which means that the distribution of estimates of A is centered around the true value of A (for proofs and further details on the assumptions behind Akaike’s theorem, see Sakamoto and others, 1986). This gives rise to a model selection procedure, Akaike’s Information Criterion (AIC), which says that we should choose the model that has the highest estimated predictive accuracy, given the data at hand. In practice, AIC implies that when the best-fitting parabola fits the data sample better than the best-fitting straight line, but not so much better that this outweighs its greater complexity (k), the straight line should be used for making predictions. Importantly, the penalty imposed on complexity has less influence on model selection the larger the sample of data, meaning that simplicity matters more for predictive accuracy when dealing with smaller samples.

Forster and Sober argue that Akaike’s theorem explains why simplicity has a quantifiable positive effect on predictive accuracy by combating the risk of over-fitting to noisy data. Hence, if one is interested in generating accurate predictions—for instance, of future data—one has a clear rationale for preferring simpler models. Forster and Sober are explicit that this proposal is only meant to apply to scientific contexts that can be understood from within a model selection framework, where predictive accuracy is the central goal of inquiry and there is a certain amount of error or noise in the data. Hence, they do not view Akaike’s work as offering a complete solution to the problem of justifying preferences for simpler theories. However, they have argued that a very significant number of scientific inference problems can be understood from an Akaikian perspective.

Several objections have been raised against Forster and Sober’s philosophical use of Akaike’s work. One objection is that the measure of simplicity employed by AIC is not language invariant, since the number of adjustable parameters a model contains depends on how the model is described. However, Forster and Sober argue that though, for practical purposes, the quantity, k, is normally spelt out in terms of number of adjustable parameters, it is in fact more accurately explicated in terms of the notion of the dimension of a family of functions, which is language invariant. Another objection is that AIC is not statistically consistent. Forster and Sober reply that this charge rests on a confusion over what AIC is meant to estimate: for example, erroneously assuming that AIC is meant to be estimator of the true value of k (the size of the simplest model that contains the true hypothesis), rather than an estimator of the predictive accuracy of a particular model at hand. Another worry is that over-fitting considerations imply that an idealized false model will often make more accurate predictions than a more realistic model, so the justification is merely instrumentalist and cannot warrant the use of simplicity as a criterion for hypothesis acceptance where hypotheses are construed realistically, rather than just as predictive tools. For their part, Forster and Sober are quite happy to accept this instrumentalist construal of the role of simplicity in curve-fitting and model selection: in this context, simplicity is not a guide to the truth, but to predictive accuracy. Finally, there are a variety of objections concerning the nature and validity of the assumptions behind Akaikie’s theorem and whether AIC is applicable to some important classes of model selection problems (for discussion, see Kieseppä, 1997; Forster, 1999, 2001; Howson and Urbach, 2006; Dowe and others, 2007; Sober, 2007; Kelly, 2010).

iv. Truth-Finding Efficiency

An important recent proposal about how to justify preferences for simpler theories has come from work in the interdisciplinary field known as formal learning theory (Schulte, 1999; Kelly, 2004, 2007, 2010). It has been proposed that even if we do not know whether the world is simple or complex, inferential rules that are biased towards simple hypotheses can be shown to converge to the truth more efficiently than alternative inferential rules. According to this proposal, an inferential rule is said to converge to the truth efficiently, if, relative to other possible convergent inferential rules, it minimizes the maximum number of U-turns or “retractions” of opinion that might be required of the inquirer while using the rule to guide her decisions on what to believe given the data. Such procedures are said to converge to the truth more directly and in a more stable fashion, since they require fewer changes of mind along the way. The proposal is that even if we do not know whether the truth is simple or complex, scientific inference procedures that are biased towards simplicity can be shown a priori to be optimally efficient in this sense, converging to the truth in the most direct and stable way possible.

To illustrate the basic logic behind this proposal, consider the following example from Oliver Schulte (1999). Suppose that we are investigating the existence of hypothetical particle, Ω. If Ω does exist, we will be able to detect it with an appropriate measurement device. However, as yet, it has not been detected. What attitude should we take towards the existence Ω? Let us say that Ockham’s Razor suggests that we deny that Ω exists until it is detected (if ever). Alternatively, we could assert that Ω does exist until a finite number of attempts to detect Ω have proved to be unsuccessful, say ten thousand, in which case, we assert that Ω does not exist; or, we could withhold judgment until Ω is either detected, or there have been ten thousand unsuccessful attempts to detect it. Since we are assuming that existent particles do not go undetected forever, abiding by any of three of these inferential rules will enable us to converge to the truth in the limit, whether Ω exists or not. However, Schulte argues that Ockham’s Razor provides the most efficient route to the truth. This is because following Ockham’s Razor incurs a maximum of only one retraction of opinion: retracting an assertion of non-existence to an assertion of existence, if Ω is detected. In contrast, the alternative inferential rules both incur a maximum of two retractions, since Ω could go undetected ten thousand times, but is then detected on the ten thousandth and one time. Hence, truth-finding efficiency requires that one adopt Ockham’s Razor and presume that Ω does not exist until it is detected.

Kevin Kelly has further developed this U-turn argument in considerable detail. Kelly argues that, with suitable refinements, it can be extended to an extremely wide variety of real world scientific inference problems. Importantly, Kelly has argued that, on this proposal, simplicity should not be seen as purely a pragmatic consideration in theory choice. While simplicity cannot be regarded as a direct indicator of truth, we do nonetheless have a reason to think that the practice of favoring simpler theories is a truth-conducive strategy, since it promotes speedy and stable attainment of true beliefs. Hence, simplicity should be regarded as a genuinely epistemic consideration in theory choice.

One worry about the truth-finding efficiency proposal concerns the general applicability of these results to scientific contexts in which simplicity may play a role. The U-turn argument for Ockham’s razor described above seems to depend on the evidential asymmetry between establishing that Ω exists and establishing that Ω does not exist: a detection of Ω is sufficient to establish the existence of Ω, whereas repeated failures of detection are not sufficient to establish non-existence. The argument may work where detection procedures are relatively clear-cut—for instance where there are relatively unambiguous instrument readings that count as “detections”—but what about entities that are very difficult to detect directly and where mistakes can easily be made about existence as well as non-existence? Similarly, a current stumbling block is that the U-turn argument cannot be used as a justification for the employment of simplicity biases in statistical inference, where the hypotheses under consideration do not have deductive observational consequences. Kelly is, however, optimistic about extending the U-turn argument to statistical inference. Another objection concerns the nature of the justification that is being provided here. What the U-turn argument seems to show is that the strategy of favoring the simplest theory consistent with the data may help one to find the truth with fewer reversals along the way. It does not establish that simpler theories themselves should be regarded as in any way “better” than their more complex rivals. Hence, there are doubts about the extent to which this proposal can actually make sense of standard examples of simplicity preferences at work in the history and current practice of science, where the guiding assumption seems to be that simpler theories are not to be preferred merely for strategic reasons, but because they are better theories.

c. Deflationary Approaches

Various philosophers have sought to defend broadly deflationary accounts of simplicity. Such accounts depart from all of the justificatory accounts discussed so far by rejecting the idea that simplicity should in fact be regarded as a theoretical virtue and criterion for theory choice in its own right. Rather, according to deflationary accounts, when simplicity appears to be a driving factor in theory evaluation, something else is doing the real work.

Richard Boyd (1990), for instance, has argued that scientists’ simplicity judgments are typically best understood as just covert judgements of theoretical plausibility. When a scientist claims that one theory is “simpler” than another this is often just another way of saying that the theory provides a more plausible account of the data. For Boyd, such covert judgments of theoretical plausibility are driven by the scientist’s background theories. Hence, it is the relevant background theories that do the real work in motivating the preference for the “simpler” theory, not the simplicity of the theory per se. John Norton (2003) has advocated a similar view in the context of his “material theory” of induction, according to which inductive inferences are licensed not by universal inductive rules or inference schemas, but rather by local factual assumptions about the domain of inquiry. Norton argues that the apparent use of simplicity in induction merely reflects material assumptions about the nature of the domain being investigated. For instance, when we try to fit curves to data we choose the variables and functions that we believe to be appropriate to the physical reality we are trying to get at. Hence, it is because of the facts that we believe to prevail in this domain that we prefer a “simple” linear function to a quadratic one, if such a curve fits the data sufficiently well. In a different domain, where we believe that different facts prevail, our decision about which hypotheses are “simple” or “complex” are likely to be very different.

Elliott Sober (1988, 1994) has defended this sort of deflationary analysis of various appeals to simplicity and parsimony in evolutionary biology. For example, Sober argues that the common claim that group selection hypotheses are “less parsimonious” and hence to be taken less seriously as explanations for biological adaptations than individual selection hypotheses, rests on substantive assumptions about the comparative rarity of the conditions required for group selection to occur. Hence, the appeal to Ockham’s Razor in this context is just a covert appeal to local background knowledge. Other attempts to offer deflationary analyses of particular appeals to simplicity in science include Plutynski (2005), who focuses on the Fisher-Wright debate in evolutionary biology, and Fitzpatrick (2009), who focuses on appeals to simplicity in debates over the cognitive capacities of non-human primates.

If such deflationary analyses of the putative role of simplicity in particular scientific contexts turn out to be plausible, then problems concerning how to measure simplicity and how to offer a general justification for preferring simpler theories can be avoided, since simplicity per se can be shown to do no substantive work in the relevant inferences. However, many philosophers are skeptical that such deflationary analyses are possible for many of the contexts where simplicity considerations have been thought to play an important role. Kelly (2010), for example, has argued that simplicity typically comes into play when our background knowledge underdetermines theory choice. Sober himself seems to advocate a mixed view: some appeals to simplicity in science are best understood in deflationary terms, others are better understood in terms of Akaikian model selection theory.

5. Conclusion

The putative role of considerations of simplicity in the history and current practice of science gives rise to a number of philosophical problems, including the problem of precisely defining and measuring theoretical simplicity, and the problem of justifying preferences for simpler theories. As this survey of the literature on simplicity in the philosophy of science demonstrates, these problems have turned out to be surprisingly resistant to resolution, and there remains a live debate amongst philosophers of science about how to deal with them. On the other hand, there is no disputing the fact that practicing scientists continue to find it useful to appeal to various notions of simplicity in their work. Thus, in many ways, the debate over simplicity resembles other long-running debates in the philosophy science, such as that over the justification for induction (which, it turns out, is closely related to the problem of justifying preferences for simpler theories). Though there is arguably more skepticism within the scientific community about the legitimacy of choosing between rival theories on grounds of simplicity than there is about the legitimacy of inductive inference—the latter being a complete non-issue for practicing scientists—as is the case with induction, very many scientists continue to employ practices and methods that utilize notions of simplicity to great scientific effect, assuming that appropriate solutions to the philosophical problems that these practices give rise to do in fact exist, even though philosophers have so far failed to articulate them. However, as this survey has also shown, statisticians, information and learning theorists, and other scientists have been making increasingly important contributions to the debate over the philosophical underpinning for these practices.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Ackerman, R. 1961. Inductive simplicity. Philosophy of Science, 28, 162-171.
    • Argues against the claim that simplicity considerations play a significant role in inductive inference. Critiques measures of simplicity proposed by Jeffreys, Kemeny, and Popper.
  • Akaike, H. 1973. Information theory and the extension of the maximum likelihood principle. In B. Petrov and F. Csaki (eds.), Second International Symposium on Information Theory. Budapest: Akademiai Kiado.
    • Laid the foundations for model selection theory. Proves a theorem suggesting that the simplicity of a model is relevant to estimating its future predictive accuracy. Highly technical.
  • Baker, A. 2003. Quantitative parsimony and explanatory power. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 54, 245-259.
    • Builds on Nolan (1997), argues that quantitative parsimony is linked with explanatory power.
  • Baker, A. 2007. Occam’s Razor in science: a case study from biogeography. Biology and Philosophy, 22, 193-215.
    • Argues for a “naturalistic” justification of Ockham’s Razor and that preferences for ontological parsimony played a significant role in the late 19th century debate in bio-geography between dispersalist and extensionist theories.
  • Barnes, E.C. 2000. Ockham’s razor and the anti-superfluity principle. Erkenntnis, 53, 353-374.
    • Draws a useful distinction between two different interpretations of Ockham’s Razor: the anti-superfluity principle and the anti-quantity principle. Explicates an evidential justification for anti-superfluity principle.
  • Boyd, R. 1990. Observations, explanatory power, and simplicity: towards a non-Humean account. In R. Boyd, P. Gasper and J.D. Trout (eds.), The Philosophy of Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Argues that appeals to simplicity in theory evaluation are typically best understood as covert judgments of theoretical plausibility.
  • Bunge, M. 1961. The weight of simplicity in the construction and assaying of scientific theories. Philosophy of Science, 28, 162-171.
    • Takes a skeptical view about the importance and justifiability of a simplicity criterion in theory evaluation.
  • Carlson, E. 1966. The Gene: A Critical History. Philadelphia: Saunders.
    • Argues that simplicity considerations played a significant role in several important debates in the history of genetics.
  • Carnap, R. 1950. Logical Foundations of Probability. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Chater, N. 1999. The search for simplicity: a fundamental cognitive principle. The Quarterly Journal of Experimental Psychology, 52A, 273-302.
    • Argues that simplicity plays a fundamental role in human reasoning, with simplicity to be defined in terms of Kolmogorov complexity.
  • Cohen, I.B. 1985. Revolutions in Science. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Cohen, I.B. 1999. A guide to Newton’s Principia. In I. Newton, The Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy; A New Translation by I. Bernard Cohen and Anne Whitman. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Crick, F. 1988. What Mad Pursuit: a Personal View of Scientific Discovery. New York: Basic Books.
    • Argues that the application of Ockham’s Razor to biology is inadvisable.
  • Dowe, D, Gardner, S., and Oppy, G. 2007. Bayes not bust! Why simplicity is no problem for Bayesians. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 58, 709-754.
    • Contra Forster and Sober (1994), argues that Bayesians can make sense of the role of simplicity in curve-fitting.
  • Duhem, P. 1954. The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Einstein, A. 1954. Ideas and Opinions. New York: Crown.
    • Einstein’s views about the role of simplicity in physics.
  • Fitzpatrick, S. 2009. The primate mindreading controversy: a case study in simplicity and methodology in animal psychology. In R. Lurz (ed.), The Philosophy of Animal Minds. New York: Cambridge University Press.
    • Advocates a deflationary analysis of appeals to simplicity in debates over the cognitive capacities of non-human primates.
  • Forster, M. 1995. Bayes and bust: simplicity as a problem for a probabilist’s approach to confirmation. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 46, 399-424.
    • Argues that the Bayesian approach to scientific reasoning is inadequate because it cannot make sense of the role of simplicity in theory evaluation.
  • Forster, M. 1999. Model selection in science: the problem of language variance. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 50, 83-102.
    • Responds to criticisms of Forster and Sober (1994). Argues that AIC relies on a language invariant measure of simplicity.
  • Forster, M. 2001. The new science of simplicity. In A. Zellner, H. Keuzenkamp and M. McAleer (eds.), Simplicity, Inference and Modelling. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Accessible introduction to model selection theory. Describes how different procedures, including AIC, BIC, and MDL, trade-off simplicity and fit to the data.
  • Forster, M. and Sober, E. 1994. How to tell when simpler, more unified, or less ad hoc theories will provide more accurate predictions. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 45, 1-35.
    • Explication of AIC statistics and its relevance to the philosophical problem of justifying preferences for simpler theories. Argues against Bayesian approaches to simplicity. Technical in places.
  • Foster, M. and Martin, M. 1966. Probability, Confirmation, and Simplicity: Readings in the Philosophy of Inductive Logic. New York: The Odyssey Press.
    • Anthology of papers discussing the role of simplicity in induction. Contains important papers by Ackermann, Barker, Bunge, Goodman, Kemeny, and Quine.
  • Friedman, M. 1974. Explanation and scientific understanding. Journal of Philosophy, LXXI, 1-19.
    • Defends a unification account of explanation, connects simplicity with explanatoriness.
  • Galilei, G. 1962. Dialogues concerning the Two Chief World Systems. Berkeley: University of California Press.
    • Classic defense of Copernicanism with significant emphasis placed on the greater simplicity and harmony of the Copernican system. Asserts that nature does nothing in vain.
  • Gauch, H. 2003. Scientific Method in Practice. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Wide-ranging discussion of the scientific method written by a scientist for scientists. Contains a chapter on the importance of parsimony in science.
  • Gauch, H. 2006. Winning the accuracy game. American Scientist, 94, March-April 2006, 134-141.
    • Useful informal presentation of the concept of Ockham’s hill and its importance to scientific research in a number of fields.
  • Gingerich, O. 1993. The Eye of Heaven: Ptolemy, Copernicus, Kepler. New York: American Institute of Physics.
  • Glymour, C. 1980. Theory and Evidence. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • An important critique of Bayesian attempts to make sense of the role of simplicity in science. Defends a “boot-strapping” analysis of the simplicity arguments for Copernicanism and Newton’s argument for universal gravitation.
  • Goodman, N. 1943. On the simplicity of ideas. Journal of Symbolic Logic, 8, 107-1.
  • Goodman, N. 1955. Axiomatic measurement of simplicity. Journal of Philosophy, 52, 709-722.
  • Goodman, N. 1958. The test of simplicity. Science, 128, October 31st 1958, 1064-1069.
    • Reasonably accessible introduction to Goodman’s attempts to formulate a measure of logical simplicity.
  • Goodman, N. 1959. Recent developments in the theory of simplicity. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 19, 429-446.
    • Response to criticisms of Goodman (1955).
  • Goodman, N. 1961. Safety, strength, simplicity. Philosophy of Science, 28, 150-151.
    • Argues that simplicity cannot be equated with testability, empirical content, or paucity of assumption.
  • Goodman, N. 1983. Fact, Fiction and Forecast (4th edition). Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Harman, G. 1999. Simplicity as a pragmatic criterion for deciding what hypotheses to take seriously. In G. Harman, Reasoning, Meaning and Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Defends the claim that simplicity is a fundamental component of inductive inference and that this role has a pragmatic justification.
  • Harman, G. and Kulkarni, S. 2007. Reliable Reasoning: Induction and Statistical Learning Theory. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Accessible introduction to statistical learning theory and VC dimension.
  • Harper, W. 2002. Newton’s argument for universal gravitation. In I.B. Cohen and G.E. Smith (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Newton. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hesse, M. 1967. Simplicity. In P. Edwards (ed.), The Encyclopaedia of Philosophy, vol. 7. New York: Macmillan.
    • Focuses on attempts by Jeffreys, Popper, Kemeny, and Goodman to formulate measures of simplicity.
  • Hesse, M. 1974. The Structure of Scientific Inference. London: Macmillan.
    • Defends the view that simplicity is a determinant of prior probability. Useful discussion of the role of simplicity in Einstein’s work.
  • Holton, G. 1974. Thematic Origins of Modern Science: Kepler to Einstein. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Discusses the role of aesthetic considerations, including simplicity, in the history of science.
  • Hoffman, R., Minkin, V., and Carpenter, B. 1997. Ockham’s Razor and chemistry. Hyle, 3, 3-28.
    • Discussion by three chemists of the benefits and pitfalls of applying Ockham’s Razor in chemical research.
  • Howson, C. and Urbach, P. 2006. Scientific Reasoning: The Bayesian Approach (Third Edition). Chicago: Open Court.
    • Contains a useful survey of Bayesian attempts to make sense of the role of simplicity in theory evaluation. Technical in places.
  • Jeffreys, H. 1957. Scientific Inference (2nd edition). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Defends the “simplicity postulate” that simpler theories have higher prior probability.
  • Jeffreys, H. 1961. Theory of Probability. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Outline and defense of the Bayesian approach to scientific inference. Discusses the role of simplicity in the determination of priors and likelihoods.
  • Kelly, K. 2004. Justification as truth-finding efficiency: how Ockham’s Razor works. Minds and Machines, 14, 485-505.
    • Argues that Ockham’s Razor is justified by considerations of truth-finding efficiency. Critiques Bayesian, Akiakian, and other traditional attempts to justify simplicity preferences. Technical in places.
  • Kelly, K. 2007. How simplicity helps you find the truth without pointing at it. In M. Friend, N. Goethe, and V.Harizanov (eds.), Induction, Algorithmic Learning Theory, and Philosophy. Dordrecht: Springer.
    • Refinement and development of the argument found in Kelly (2004) and Schulte (1999). Technical.
  • Kelly, K. 2010. Simplicity, truth and probability. In P. Bandyopadhyay and M. Forster (eds.), Handbook of the Philosophy of Statistics. Dordrecht: Elsevier.
    • Expands and develops the argument found in Kelly (2007). Detailed critique of Bayesian accounts of simplicity. Technical.
  • Kelly, K. and Glymour, C. 2004. Why probability does not capture the logic of scientific justification. In C. Hitchcock (ed.), Contemporary Debates in the Philosophy of Science. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Argues that Bayesians can’t make sense of Ockham’s Razor.
  • Kemeny, J. 1955. Two measures of complexity. Journal of Philosophy, 52, p722-733.
    • Develops some of Goodman’s ideas about how to measure the logical simplicity of predicates and systems of predicates. Proposes a measure of simplicity similar to Popper’s (1959) falsifiability measure.
  • Kieseppä, I. A. 1997. Akaike Information Criterion, curve-fitting, and the philosophical problem of simplicity. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 48, p21-48.
    • Critique of Forster and Sober (1994). Argues that Akaike’s theorem has little relevance to traditional philosophical problems surrounding simplicity. Highly technical.
  • Kitcher, P. 1989. Explanatory unification and the causal structure of the world. In P. Kitcher and W. Salmon, Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol 13: Scientific Explanation, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
    • Defends a unification theory of explanation. Argues that simplicity contributes to explanatory power.
  • Kuhn, T. 1957. The Copernican Revolution. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Influential discussion of the role of simplicity in the arguments for Copernicanism.
  • Kuhn, T. 1962. The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Kuipers, T. 2002. Beauty: a road to truth. Synthese, 131, 291-328.
    • Attempts to show how aesthetic considerations might be indicative of truth.
  • Kyburg, H. 1961. A modest proposal concerning simplicity. Philosophical Review, 70, 390-395.
    • Important critique of Goodman (1955). Argues that simplicity be identified with the number of quantifiers in a theory.
  • Lakatos, I. and Zahar, E. 1978. Why did Copernicus’s research programme supersede Ptolemy’s? In J. Worrall and G. Curie (eds.), The Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes: Philosophical Papers of Imre Lakatos, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Argues that simplicity did not really play a significant role in the Copernican Revolution.
  • Lewis, D. 1973. Counterfactuals. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
    • Argues that quantitative parsimony is less important than qualitative parsimony in scientific and philosophical theorizing.
  • Li, M. and Vitányi, P. 1997. An Introduction to Kolmogorov Complexity and its Applications (2nd edition). New York: Springer.
    • Detailed elaboration of Kolmogorov complexity as a measure of simplicity. Highly technical.
  • Lipton, P. 2004. Inference to the Best Explanation (2nd edition). Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
    • Account of inference to the best explanation as inference to the “loveliest” explanation. Defends the claim that simplicity contributes to explanatory loveliness.
  • Lombrozo, T. 2007. Simplicity and probability in causal explanation. Cognitive Psychology, 55, 232–257.
    • Argues that simplicity is used as a guide to assessing the probability of causal explanations.
  • Lu, H., Yuille, A., Liljeholm, M., Cheng, P. W., and Holyoak, K. J. 2006. Modeling causal learning using Bayesian generic priors on generative and preventive powers. In R. Sun and N. Miyake (eds.), Proceedings of the 28th annual conference of the cognitive science society, 519–524. Mahwah, NJ: Erlbaum.
    • Argues that simplicity plays a significant role in causal learning.
  • MacKay, D. 1992. Bayesian interpolation. Neural Computation, 4, 415-447.
    • First presentation of the concept of Ockham’s Hill.
  • Martens, R. 2009. Harmony and simplicity: aesthetic virtues and the rise of testability. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 40, 258-266.
    • Discussion of the Copernican simplicity arguments and recent attempts to reconstruct the justification for them.
  • McAlleer, M. 2001. Simplicity: views of some Nobel laureates in economic science. In A. Zellner, H. Keuzenkamp and M. McAleer (eds.), Simplicity, Inference and Modelling. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Interesting survey of the views of famous economists on the place of simplicity considerations in their work.
  • McAllister, J. W. 1996. Beauty and Revolution in Science. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • Proposes that scientists’ simplicity preferences are the product of an aesthetic induction.
  • Mill, J.S. 1867. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy. London: Walter Scott.
  • Myrvold, W. 2003. A Bayesian account of the virtue of unification. Philosophy of Science, 70, 399-423.
  • Newton, I. 1999. The Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy; A New Translation by I. Bernard Cohen and Anne Whitman. Berkeley: University of California Press.
    • Contains Newton’s “rules for the study of natural philosophy”, which includes a version of Ockham’s Razor, defended in terms of the simplicity of nature. These rules play an explicit role in Newton’s argument for universal gravitation.
  • Nolan, D. 1997. Quantitative Parsimony. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 48, 329-343.
    • Contra Lewis (1973), argues that quantitative parsimony has been important in the history of science.
  • Norton, J. 2000. ‘Nature is the realization of the simplest conceivable mathematical ideas’: Einstein and canon of mathematical simplicity. Studies in the History and Philosophy of Modern Physics, 31, 135-170.
    • Discusses the evolution of Einstein’s thinking about the role of mathematical simplicity in physical theorizing.
  • Norton, J. 2003. A material theory of induction. Philosophy of Science, 70, p647-670.
    • Defends a “material” theory of induction. Argues that appeals to simplicity in induction reflect factual assumptions about the domain of inquiry.
  • Oreskes, N., Shrader-Frechette, K., Belitz, K. 1994. Verification, validation, and confirmation of numerical models in the earth sciences. Science, 263, 641-646.
  • Palter, R. 1970. An approach to the history of early astronomy. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 1, 93-133.
  • Pais, A. 1982. Subtle Is the Lord: The science and life of Albert Einstein. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1931. Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, vol 6. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss, and A. Burks (eds.). Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Plutynski, A. 2005. Parsimony and the Fisher-Wright debate. Biology and Philosophy, 20, 697-713.
    • Advocates a deflationary analysis of appeals to parsimony in debates between Wrightian and neo-Fisherian models of natural selection.
  • Popper, K. 1959. The Logic of Scientific Discovery. London: Hutchinson.
    • Argues that simplicity = empirical content = falsifiability.
  • Priest, G. 1976. Gruesome simplicity. Philosophy of Science, 43, 432-437.
    • Shows that standard measures of simplicity in curve-fitting are language variant.
  • Raftery, A., Madigan, D., and Hoeting, J. 1997. Bayesian model averaging for linear regression models. Journal of the American Statistical Association, 92, 179-191.
  • Reichenbach, H. 1949. On the justification of induction. In H. Feigl and W. Sellars (eds.), Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts.
  • Rosencrantz, R. 1983. Why Glymour is a Bayesian. In J. Earman (ed.), Testing Scientific Theories. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
    • Responds to Glymour (1980). Argues that simpler theories have higher likelihoods, using Copernican vs. Ptolemaic astronomy as an example.
  • Rothwell, G. 2006. Notes for the occasional major case manager. FBI Law Enforcement Bulletin, 75, 20-24.
    • Emphasizes the importance of Ockham’s Razor in criminal investigation.
  • Sakamoto, Y., Ishiguro, M., and Kitagawa, G. 1986. Akaike Information Criterion Statistics. New York: Springer.
  • Schaffner, K. 1974. Einstein versus Lorentz: research programmes and the logic of comparative theory evaluation. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 25, 45-78.
    • Argues that simplicity played a significant role in the development and early acceptance of special relativity.
  • Schulte, O. 1999. Means-end epistemology. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 50, 1-31.
    • First statement of the claim that Ockham’s Razor can be justified in terms of truth-finding efficiency.
  • Simon, H. 1962. The architecture of complexity. Proceedings of the American Philosophical Society, 106, 467-482.
    • Important discussion by a Nobel laureate of features common to complex systems in nature.
  • Sober, E. 1975. Simplicity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Argues that simplicity can be defined in terms of question-relative informativeness. Technical in places.
  • Sober, E. 1981. The principle of parsimony. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 32, 145-156.
    • Distinguishes between “agnostic” and “atheistic” versions of Ockham’s Razor. Argues that the atheistic razor has an inductive justification.
  • Sober, E. 1988. Reconstructing the Past: Parsimony, Evolution and Inference. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Defends a deflationary account of simplicity in the context of the use of parsimony methods in evolutionary biology.
  • Sober, E. 1994. Let’s razor Ockham’s Razor. In E. Sober, From a Biological Point of View, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Argues that the use of Ockham’s Razor is grounded in local background assumptions.
  • Sober, E. 2001a. What is the problem of simplicity? In H. Keuzenkamp, M. McAlleer, and A. Zellner (eds.), Simplicity, Inference and Modelling. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sober, E. 2001b. Simplicity. In W.H. Newton-Smith (ed.), A Companion to the Philosophy of Science, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Sober, E. 2007. Evidence and Evolution. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Solomonoff, R.J. 1964. A formal theory of inductive inference, part 1 and part 2. Information and Control, 7, 1-22, 224-254.
  • Suppes, P. 1956. Nelson Goodman on the concept of logical simplicity. Philosophy of Science, 23, 153-159.
  • Swinburne, R. 2001. Epistemic Justification. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Argues that the principle that simpler theories are more probably true is a fundamental a priori principle.
  • Thagard, P. 1988. Computational Philosophy of Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Simplicity is a determinant of the goodness of an explanation and can be measured in terms of the paucity of auxiliary assumptions relative to the number of facts explained.
  • Thorburn, W. 1918. The myth of Occam’s Razor. Mind, 23, 345-353.
    • Argues that William of Ockham would not have advocated many of the principles that have been attributed to him.
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    • Argues that physicists demand simplicity in physical principles before they can be taken seriously.
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    • Attempts to justify preferences for simpler theories in virtue of such theories having higher likelihoods.
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Author Information

Simon Fitzpatrick
John Carroll University
U. S. A.

Zeno’s Paradoxes

Zeno_of_EleaIn the fifth century B.C.E., Zeno of Elea offered arguments that led to conclusions contradicting what we all know from our physical experience–that runners run, that arrows fly, and that there are many different things in the world. The arguments were paradoxes for the ancient Greek philosophers. Because most of the arguments turn crucially on the notion that space and time are infinitely divisible—for example, that for any distance there is such a thing as half that distance, and so on—Zeno was the first person in history to show that the concept of infinity is problematical.

In his Achilles Paradox, Achilles races to catch a slower runner–for example, a tortoise that is crawling away from him. The tortoise has a head start, so if Achilles hopes to overtake it, he must run at least to the place where the tortoise presently is, but by the time he arrives there, it will have crawled to a new place, so then Achilles must run to this new place, but the tortoise meanwhile will have crawled on, and so forth. Achilles will never catch the tortoise, says Zeno. Therefore, good reasoning shows that fast runners never can catch slow ones. So much the worse for the claim that motion really occurs, Zeno says in defense of his mentor Parmenides who had argued that motion is an illusion.

Although practically no scholars today would agree with Zeno’s conclusion, we can not escape the paradox by jumping up from our seat and chasing down a tortoise, nor by saying Achilles should run to some other target place ahead of where the tortoise is at the moment. What is required is an analysis of Zeno's own argument that does not get us embroiled in new paradoxes nor impoverish our mathematics and science.

This article explains his ten known paradoxes and considers the treatments that have been offered. Zeno assumed distances and durations can be divided into an actual infinity (what we now call a transfinite infinity) of indivisible parts, and he assumed these are too many for the runner to complete. Aristotle's treatment said Zeno should have assumed there are only potential infinities, and that neither places nor times divide into indivisible parts. His treatment became the generally accepted solution until the late 19th century. The current standard treatment says Zeno was right to conclude that a runner's path contains an actual infinity of parts, but he was mistaken to assume this is too many. This treatment employs the apparatus of calculus which has proved its indispensability for the development of modern science. In the twentieth century it became clear to most researchers that disallowing actual infinities, as Aristotle wanted, hampers the growth of set theory and ultimately of mathematics and physics. This standard treatment took hundreds of years to perfect and was due to the flexibility of intellectuals who were willing to replace old theories and their concepts with more fruitful ones, despite the damage done to common sense and our naive intuitions. The article ends by exploring newer treatments of the paradoxes—and related paradoxes such as Thomson's Lamp Paradox—that were developed since the 1950s.

Table of Contents

  1. Zeno of Elea
    1. His Life
    2. His Book
    3. His Goals
    4. His Method
  2. The Standard Solution to the Paradoxes
  3. The Ten Paradoxes
    1. Paradoxes of Motion
      1. The Achilles
      2. The Dichotomy (The Racetrack)
      3. The Arrow
      4. The Moving Rows (The Stadium)
    2. Paradoxes of Plurality
      1. Alike and Unlike
      2. Limited and Unlimited
      3. Large and Small
      4. Infinite Divisibility
    3. Other Paradoxes
      1. The Grain of Millet
      2. Against Place
  4. Aristotle’s Treatment of the Paradoxes
  5. Other Issues Involving the Paradoxes
    1. Consequences of Accepting the Standard Solution
    2. Criticisms of the Standard Solution
    3. Supertasks and Infinity Machines
    4. Constructivism
    5. Nonstandard Analysis
    6. Smooth Infinitesimal Analysis
  6. The Legacy and Current Significance of the Paradoxes
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Zeno of Elea

a. His Life

Zeno was born in about 490 B.C.E. in Elea, now Velia, in southern Italy; and he died in about 430 B.C.E. He was a friend and student of Parmenides, who was twenty-five years older and also from Elea. There is little additional, reliable information about Zeno’s life. Plato remarked (in Parmenides 127b) that Parmenides took Zeno to Athens with him where he encountered Socrates, who was about twenty years younger than Zeno, but today’s scholars consider this encounter to have been invented by Plato to improve the story line. Zeno is reported to have been arrested for taking weapons to rebels opposed to the tyrant who ruled Elea. When asked about his accomplices, Zeno said he wished to whisper something privately to the tyrant. But when the tyrant came near, Zeno bit him, and would not let go until he was stabbed. Diogenes Laërtius reported this apocryphal story seven hundred years after Zeno’s death.

b. His Book

According to Plato’s commentary in his Parmenides (127a to 128e), Zeno brought a treatise with him when he visited Athens. It was said to be a book of paradoxes defending the philosophy of Parmenides. Plato and Aristotle may have had access to the book, but Plato did not state any of the arguments, and Aristotle’s presentations of the arguments are very compressed. A thousand years after Zeno, the Greek philosophers Proclus and Simplicius commented on the book and its arguments. They had access to some of the book, perhaps to all of it, but it has not survived. Proclus is the first person to tell us that the book contained forty arguments. This number is confirmed by the sixth century commentator Elias, who is regarded as an independent source because he does not mention Proclus. Unfortunately, we know of no specific dates for when Zeno composed any of his paradoxes, and we know very little of how Zeno stated his own paradoxes. We do have a direct quotation via Simplicius of the Paradox of Denseness and a partial quotation via Simplicius of the Large and Small Paradox. In total we know of less than two hundred words that can be attributed to Zeno. Our knowledge of these two paradoxes and the other seven comes to us indirectly through paraphrases of them, and comments on them, primarily by Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.), but also by Plato (427-347 B.C.E.), Proclus (410-485 C.E.), and Simplicius (490-560 C.E.). The names of the paradoxes were created by commentators, not by Zeno.

c. His Goals

In the early fifth century B.C.E., Parmenides emphasized the distinction between appearance and reality. Reality, he said, is a seamless unity that is unchanging and can not be destroyed, so appearances of reality are deceptive. Our ordinary observation reports are false; they do not report what is real. This metaphysical theory is the opposite of Heraclitus’ theory, but evidently it was supported by Zeno. Although we do not know from Zeno himself whether he accepted his own paradoxical arguments or what point he was making with thm, according to Plato the paradoxes were designed to provide detailed, supporting arguments for Parmenides by demonstrating that our common sense confidence in the reality of motion, change, and ontological plurality (that is, that there exist many things), involve absurdities. Plato’s classical interpretation of Zeno was accepted by Aristotle and by most other commentators throughout the intervening centuries.

Eudemus, a student of Aristotle, offered another interpretation. He suggested that Zeno was challenging both pluralism and Parmenides’ idea of monism, which would imply that Zeno was a nihilist. Paul Tannery in 1885 and Wallace Matson in 2001 offer a third interpretation of Zeno’s goals regarding the paradoxes of motion. Plato and Aristotle did not understand Zeno’s arguments nor his purpose, they say. Zeno was actually challenging the Pythagoreans and their particular brand of pluralism, not Greek common sense. Zeno was not trying to directly support Parmenides. Instead, he intended to show that Parmenides’ opponents are committed to denying the very motion, change, and plurality they believe in, and Zeno’s arguments were completely successful. This controversial issue about interpreting Zeno’s purposes will not be pursued further in this article, and Plato’s classical interpretation will be assumed.

d. His Method

Before Zeno, Greek thinkers favored presenting their philosophical views by writing poetry. Zeno began the grand shift away from poetry toward a prose that contained explicit premises and conclusions. And he employed the method of indirect proof in his paradoxes by temporarily assuming some thesis that he opposed and then attempting to deduce an absurd conclusion or a contradiction, thereby undermining the temporary assumption. This method of indirect proof or reductio ad absurdum probably originated with his teacher Parmenides [although this is disputed in the scholarly literature], but Zeno used it more systematically.

2. The Standard Solution to the Paradoxes

Any paradox can be treated by abandoning enough of its crucial assumptions. For Zeno's it is very interesting to consider which assumptions to abandon, and why those. A paradox is an argument that reaches a contradiction by apparently legitimate steps from apparently reasonable assumptions, while the experts at the time can not agree on the way out of the paradox, that is, agree on its resolution. It is this latter point about disagreement among the experts that distinguishes a paradox from a mere puzzle in the ordinary sense of that term. Zeno’s paradoxes are now generally considered to be puzzles because of the wide agreement among today’s experts that there is at least one acceptable resolution of the paradoxes.

This resolution is called the Standard Solution. It presupposes calculus, the rest of standard real analysis, and classical mechanics. It assumes that physical processes are sets of point-events. It implies that motions, durations, distances and line segments are all linear continua composed of points, then uses these ideas to challenge various assumptions made, and steps taken, by Zeno. To be very brief and anachronistic, Zeno's mistake (and Aristotle's mistake) was not to have used calculus. More specifically, in the case of the paradoxes of motion such as the Achilles and the Dichotomy, Zeno's mistake was not his assuming there is a completed infinity of places for the runner to go, which was what Aristotle said was Zeno's mistake; Zeno's and Aristotle's mistake was in assuming that this is too many places (for the runner to go to in a finite time).

A key background assumption of the Standard Solution is that this resolution is not simply employing some concepts that will undermine Zeno’s reasoning–Aristotle's reasoning does that, too, at least for most of the paradoxes–but that it is employing concepts which have been shown to be appropriate for the development of a coherent and fruitful system of mathematics and physical science. Aristotle's treatment of the paradoxes does not employ these fruitful concepts. The Standard Solution is much more complicated than Aristotle's treatment, and no single person can be credited with creating it.

The Standard Solution uses calculus. In calculus we need to speak of one event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds after another. In ordinary discourse outside of science we would never need this kind of precision. The need for this precision has led to requiring time to be a linear continuum, very much like a segment of the real number line.

Calculus was invented in the late 1600's by Newton and Leibniz. Their calculus is a technique for treating continuous motion as being composed of an infinite number of infinitesimal steps. After the acceptance of calculus, most all mathematicians and physicists believed that continuous motion, including Achilles' motion, should be modeled by a function which takes real numbers representing time as its argument and which gives real numbers representing spatial position as its value. This position function should be continuous or gap-free. In addition, the position function should be differentiable or smooth in order to make sense of speed, the rate of change of position. By the early 20th century most mathematicians had come to believe that, to make rigorous sense of motion, mathematics needs a fully developed set theory that rigorously defines the key concepts of real number, continuity and differentiability. Doing this requires a well defined concept of the continuum. Unfortunately Newton and Leibniz did not have a good definition of the continuum, and finding a good one required over two hundred years of work.

The continuum is a very special set; it is the standard model of the real numbers. Intuitively, a continuum is a continuous entity; it is a whole thing that has no gaps. Some examples of a continuum are the path of a runner’s center of mass, the time elapsed during this motion, ocean salinity, and the temperature along a metal rod. Distances and durations are normally considered to be real continua whereas treating the ocean salinity and the rod's temperature as continua is a very useful approximation for many calculations in physics even though we know that at the atomic level the approximation breaks down.

The distinction between “a” continuum and “the” continuum is that “the” continuum is the paradigm of “a” continuum. The continuum is the mathematical line, the line of geometry, which is standardly understood to have the same structure as the real numbers in their natural order. Real numbers and points on the continuum can be put into a one-to-one order-preserving correspondence. There are not enough rational numbers for this correspondence even though the rational numbers are dense, too (in the sense that between any two rational numbers there is another rational number).

For Zeno’s paradoxes, standard analysis assumes that length should be defined in terms of measure, and motion should be defined in terms of the derivative. These definitions are given in terms of the linear continuum. The most important features of any linear continuum are that (a) it is composed of points, (b) it is an actually infinite set, that is, a transfinite set, and not merely a potentially infinite set that gets bigger over time, (c) it is undivided yet infinitely divisible (that is, it is gap-free), (d) the points are so close together that no point can have a point immediately next to it, (e) between any two points there are other points, (f) the measure (such as length) of a continuum is not a matter of adding up the measures of its points nor adding up the number of its points, (g) any connected part of a continuum is also a continuum, and (h) there are an aleph-one number of points between any two points.

Physical space is not a linear continuum because it is three-dimensional and not linear; but it has one-dimensional subspaces such as paths of runners and orbits of planets; and these are linear continua if we use the path created by only one point on the runner and the orbit created by only one point on the planet. Regarding time, each (point) instant is assigned a real number as its time, and each instant is assigned a duration of zero. The time taken by Achilles to catch the tortoise is a temporal interval, a linear continuum of instants, according to the Standard Solution (but not according to Zeno or Aristotle). The Standard Solution says that the sequence of Achilles' goals (the goals of reaching the point where the tortoise is) should be abstracted from a pre-existing transfinite set, namely a linear continuum of point places along the tortoise's path. Aristotle's treatment does not do this. The next section of this article presents the details of how the concepts of the Standard Solution are used to resolve each of Zeno's Paradoxes.

Of the ten known paradoxes, The Achilles attracted the most attention over the centuries. Aristotle’s treatment of the paradox involved accusing Zeno of using the concept of an actual or completed infinity instead of the concept of a potential infinity, and accusing Zeno of failing to appreciate that a line cannot be composed of points. Aristotle’s treatment is described in detail below. It was generally accepted until the 19th century, but slowly lost ground to the Standard Solution. Some historians say he had no solution but only a verbal quibble. This article takes no side on this dispute and speaks of Aristotle’s “treatment.”

The development of calculus was the most important step in the Standard Solution of Zeno's paradoxes, so why did it take so long for the Standard Solution to be accepted after Newton and Leibniz developed their calculus? The period lasted about two hundred years. There are four reasons. (1) It took time for calculus and the rest of real analysis to prove its applicability and fruitfulness in physics. (2) It took time for the relative shallowness of Aristotle’s treatment to be recognized. (3) It took time for philosophers of science to appreciate that each theoretical concept used in a physical theory need not have its own correlate in our experience.  (4) It took time for certain problems in the foundations of mathematics to be resolved, such as finding a better definition of the continuum and avoiding the paradoxes of Cantor's naive set theory.

Point (2) is discussed in section 4 below.

Point (3) is about the time it took for philosophers of science to reject the demand, favored by Ernst Mach and many Logical Positivists, that meaningful terms in science must have “empirical meaning.” This was the demand that each physical concept be separately definable with observation terms. It was thought that, because our experience is finite, the term “actual infinite” or "completed infinity" could not have empirical meaning, but “potential infinity” could. Today, most philosophers would not restrict meaning to empirical meaning. However, for an interesting exception see Dummett (2000) which contains a theory in which time is composed of overlapping intervals rather than durationless instants, and in which the endpoints of those intervals are the initiation and termination of actual physical processes. This idea of treating time without instants develops a 1936 proposal of Russell and Whitehead. The central philosophical issue about Dummett's treatment of motion is how its adoption would affect other areas of mathematics and science.

Point (1) is about the time it took for classical mechanics to develop to the point where it was accepted as giving correct solutions to problems involving motion. Point (1) was challenged in the metaphysical literature on the grounds that the abstract account of continuity in real analysis does not truly describe either time, space or concrete physical reality. This challenge is discussed in later sections.

Point (4) arises because the standard of rigorous proof and rigorous definition of concepts has increased over the years. As a consequence, the difficulties in the foundations of real analysis, which began with George Berkeley’s criticism of inconsistencies in the use of infinitesimals in the calculus of Leibniz (and fluxions in the calculus of Newton), were not satisfactorily resolved until the early 20th century with the development of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory. The key idea was to work out the necessary and sufficient conditions for being a continuum. To achieve the goal, the conditions for being a mathematical continuum had to be strictly arithmetical and not dependent on our intuitions about space, time and motion. The idea was to revise or “tweak” the definition until it would not create new paradoxes and would still give useful theorems. When this revision was completed, it could be declared that the set of real numbers is an actual infinity, not a potential infinity, and that not only is any interval of real numbers a linear continuum, but so are the spatial paths, the temporal durations, and the motions that are mentioned in Zeno’s paradoxes. In addition, it was important to clarify how to compute the sum of an infinite series (such as 1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + ...) and how to define motion in terms of the derivative. This new mathematical system required new or better-defined mathematical concepts of compact set, connected set, continuity, continuous function, convergence-to-a-limit of an infinite sequence (such as 1/2, 1/4, 1/8, ...), curvature at a point, cut, derivative, dimension, function, integral, limit, measure, reference frame, set, and size of a set. Similarly, rigor was added to the definitions of the physical concepts of place, instant, duration, distance, and instantaneous speed. The relevant revisions were made by Euler in the 18th century and by Bolzano, Cantor, Cauchy, Dedekind, Frege, Hilbert, Lebesque, Peano, Russell, Weierstrass, and Whitehead, among others, during the 19th and early 20th centuries.

What about Leibniz's infinitesimals or Newton's fluxions? Let's stick with infinitesimals, since fluxions have the same problems and same resolution. In 1734, Berkeley had properly criticized the use of infinitesimals as being "ghosts of departed quantities" that are used inconsistently in calculus. Earlier Newton had defined instantaneous speed as the ratio of an infinitesimally small distance and an infinitesimally small duration, and he and Leibniz produced a system of calculating variable speeds that was very fruitful. But nobody in that century or the next could adequately explain what an infinitesimal was. Newton had called them “evanescent divisible quantities,” whatever that meant. Leibniz called them “vanishingly small,” but that was just as vague. The practical use of infinitesimals was unsystematic. For example, the infinitesimal dx is treated as being equal to zero when it is declared that x + dx = x, but is treated as not being zero when used in the denominator of the fraction [f(x + dx) - f(x)]/dx which is the derivative of the function f. In addition, consider the seemingly obvious Archimedean property of pairs of positive numbers: given any two positive numbers A and B, if you add enough copies of A, then you can produce a sum greater than B. This property fails if A is an infinitesimal. Finally, mathematicians gave up on answering Berkeley’s charges (and thus re-defined what we mean by standard analysis) because, in 1821, Cauchy showed how to achieve the same useful theorems of calculus by using the idea of a limit instead of an infinitesimal. Later in the 19th century, Weierstrass resolved some of the inconsistencies in Cauchy’s account and satisfactorily showed how to define continuity in terms of limits (his epsilon-delta method). As J. O. Wisdom points out (1953, p. 23), “At the same time it became clear that [Leibniz's and] Newton’s theory, with suitable amendments and additions, could be soundly based.” In an effort to provide this sound basis according to the latest, heightened standard of what counts as “sound,” Peano, Frege, Hilbert, and Russell attempted to properly axiomatize real analysis. This led in 1901 to Russell’s paradox and the fruitful controversy about how to provide a foundation to all of mathematics. That controversy still exists, but the majority view is that axiomatic Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the axiom of choice blocks all the paradoxes, legitimizes Cantor’s theory of transfinite sets, and provides the proper foundation for real analysis and other areas of mathematics. This standard real analysis lacks infinitesimals, thanks to Cauchy and Weierstrass. Standard real analysis is the mathematics that the Standard Solution applies to Zeno’s Paradoxes.

The rational numbers are not continuous although they are infinitely numerous and infinitely dense. To come up with a foundation for calculus there had to be a good definition of the continuity of the real numbers. But this required having a good definition of irrational numbers. There wasn’t one before 1872. Dedekind’s definition in 1872 defines the mysterious irrationals in terms of the familiar rationals. The result was a clear and useful definition of real numbers. The usefulness of Dedekind's definition of real numbers, and the lack of any better definition, convinced many mathematicians to be more open to accepting actually-infinite sets.

We won't explore the definitions of continuity here, but what Dedekind discovered about the reals and their relationship to the rationals was how to define a real number to be a cut of the rational numbers, where a cut is a certain ordered pair of actually-infinite sets of rational numbers.

A Dedekind cut (A,B) is defined to be a partition or cutting of the set of all the rational numbers into a left part A and a right part B. A and B are non-empty subsets, such that all rational numbers in A are less than all rational numbers in B, and also A contains no greatest number. Every real number is a unique Dedekind cut. The cut can be made at a rational number or at an irrational number. Here are examples of each:

Dedekind's real number 1/2 is ({x : x < 1/2} , {x: x ≥ 1/2}).

Dedekind's positive real number √2 is ({x : x < 0 or x2 < 2} , {x: x2 ≥ 2}).

Notice that the rational real number 1/2 is within its B set, but the irrational real number √2 is not within its B set because B contains only rational numbers. That property is what distinguishes rationals from irrationals, according to Dedekind.

For any cut (A,B), if B has a smallest number, then the real number for that cut corresponds to this smallest number, as in the definition of ½ above. Otherwise, the cut defines an irrational number which, loosely speaking, fills the gap between A and B, as in the definition of the square root of 2 above.

By defining reals in terms of rationals this way, Dedekind gave a foundation to the reals, and legitimized them by showing they are as acceptable as actually-infinite sets of rationals.

But what exactly is an actually-infinite or transfinite set, and does this idea lead to contradictions? This question needs an answer if there is to be a good theory of continuity and of real numbers. In the 1870s, Cantor clarified what an actually-infinite set is and made a convincing case that the concept does not lead to inconsistencies. These accomplishments by Cantor are why he (along with Dedekind and Weierstrass) is said by Russell to have “solved Zeno’s Paradoxes.”

That solution recommends using very different concepts and theories than those used by Zeno. The argument that this is the correct solution was presented by many people, but it was especially influenced by the work of Bertrand Russell (1914, lecture 6) and the more detailed work of Adolf Grünbaum (1967). In brief, the argument for the Standard Solution is that we have solid grounds for believing our best scientific theories, but the theories of mathematics such as calculus and Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory are indispensable to these theories, so we have solid grounds for believing in them, too. The scientific theories require a resolution of Zeno’s paradoxes and the other paradoxes; and the Standard Solution to Zeno's Paradoxes that uses standard calculus and Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory is indispensable to this resolution or at least is the best resolution, or, if not, then we can be fairly sure there is no better solution, or, if not that either, then we can be confident that the solution is good enough (for our purposes). Aristotle's treatment, on the other hand, uses concepts that hamper the growth of mathematics and science. Therefore, we should accept the Standard Solution.

In the next section, this solution will be applied to each of Zeno’s ten paradoxes.

To be optimistic, the Standard Solution represents a counterexample to the claim that philosophical problems never get solved. To be less optimistic, the Standard Solution has its drawbacks and its alternatives, and these have generated new and interesting philosophical controversies beginning in the last half of the 20th century, as will be seen in later sections. The primary alternatives contain different treatments of calculus from that developed at the end of the 19th century. Whether this implies that Zeno’s paradoxes have multiple solutions or only one is still an open question.

Did Zeno make mistakes? And was he superficial or profound? These questions are a matter of dispute in the philosophical literature. The majority position is as follows. If we give his paradoxes a sympathetic reconstruction, he correctly demonstrated that some important, classical Greek concepts are logically inconsistent, and he did not make a mistake in doing this, except in the Moving Rows Paradox, the Paradox of Alike and Unlike and the Grain of Millet Paradox, his weakest paradoxes. Zeno did assume that the classical Greek concepts were the correct concepts to use in reasoning about his paradoxes, and now we prefer revised concepts, though it would be unfair to say he blundered for not foreseeing later developments in mathematics and physics.

3. The Ten Paradoxes

Zeno probably created forty paradoxes, of which only the following ten are known. Only the first four have standard names, and the first two have received the most attention. The ten are of uneven quality. Zeno and his ancient interpreters usually stated his paradoxes badly, so it has taken some clever reconstruction over the years to reveal their full force. Below, the paradoxes are reconstructed sympathetically, and then the Standard Solution is applied to them. These reconstructions use just one of several reasonable schemes for presenting the paradoxes, but the present article does not explore the historical research about the variety of interpretive schemes and their relative plausibility.

a. Paradoxes of Motion

i. The Achilles

Achilles, who is the fastest runner of antiquity, is racing to catch the tortoise that is slowly crawling away from him. Both are moving along a linear path at constant speeds. In order to catch the tortoise, Achilles will have to reach the place where the tortoise presently is. However, by the time Achilles gets there, the tortoise will have crawled to a new location. Achilles will then have to reach this new location. By the time Achilles reaches that location, the tortoise will have moved on to yet another location, and so on forever. Zeno claims Achilles will never catch the tortoise. He might have defended this conclusion in various ways—by saying it is because the sequence of goals or locations has no final member, or requires too much distance to travel, or requires too much travel time, or requires too many tasks. However, if we do believe that Achilles succeeds and that motion is possible, then we are victims of illusion, as Parmenides says we are.

The source for Zeno's views is Aristotle (Physics 239b14-16) and some passages from Simplicius in the fifth century C.E. There is no evidence that Zeno used a tortoise rather than a slow human. The tortoise is a commentator’s addition. Aristotle spoke simply of “the runner” who competes with Achilles.

It won’t do to react and say the solution to the paradox is that there are biological limitations on how small a step Achilles can take. Achilles’ feet aren’t obligated to stop and start again at each of the locations described above, so there is no limit to how close one of those locations can be to another. It is best to think of the change from one location to another as a movement rather than as incremental steps requiring halting and starting again. Zeno is assuming that space and time are infinitely divisible; they are not discrete or atomistic. If they were, the Paradox's argument would not work.

One common complaint with Zeno’s reasoning is that he is setting up a straw man because it is obvious that Achilles cannot catch the tortoise if he continually takes a bad aim toward the place where the tortoise is; he should aim farther ahead. The mistake in this complaint is that even if Achilles took some sort of better aim, it is still true that he is required to go to every one of those locations that are the goals of the so-called “bad aims,” so Zeno's argument needs a better treatment.

The treatment called the "Standard Solution" to the Achilles Paradox uses calculus and other parts of real analysis to describe the situation. It implies that Zeno is assuming in the Achilles situation that Achilles cannot achieve his goal because

(1) there is too far to run, or

(2) there is not enough time, or

(3) there are too many places to go, or

(4) there is no final step, or

(5) there are too many tasks.

The historical record does not tell us which of these was Zeno's real assumption, but they are all false assumptions, according to the Standard Solution. Let's consider (1). Presumably Zeno would defend the assumption by remarking that the sum of the distances along so many of the runs to where the tortoise is must be infinite, which is too much for even Achilles. However, the advocate of the Standard Solution will remark, "How does Zeno know what the sum of this infinite series is?" According to the Standard Solution the sum is not infinite. Here is a graph using the methods of the Standard Solution showing the activity of Achilles as he chases the tortoise and overtakes it.

graph of Achilles and the Tortoise

To describe this graph in more detail, we need to say that Achilles' path [the path of some dimensionless point of Achilles' body] is a linear continuum and so is composed of an actual infinity of points. (An actual infinity is also called a "completed infinity" or "transfinite infinity," and the word "actual" does not mean "real" as opposed to "imaginary.") Since Zeno doesn't make this assumption, that is another source of error in Zeno's reasoning. Achilles travels a distance d1 in reaching the point x1 where the tortoise starts, but by the time Achilles reaches x1, the tortoise has moved on to a new point x2. When Achilles reaches x2, having gone an additional distance d2, the tortoise has moved on to point x3, requiring Achilles to cover an additional distance d3, and so forth. This sequence of non-overlapping distances (or intervals or sub-paths) is an actual infinity, but happily the geometric series converges. The sum of its terms d1 + d2 + d3 +… is a finite distance that Achilles can readily complete while moving at a constant speed.

Similar reasoning would apply if Zeno were to have made assumption (2) or (3). Regarding (4), the requirement that there be a final step or final sub-path is simply mistaken, according to the Standard Solution. More will be said about assumption (5) in Section 5c.

By the way, the Paradox does not require the tortoise to crawl at a constant speed but only to never stop crawling and for Achilles to travel faster on average than the tortoise. The assumption of constant speed is made simply for ease of understanding.

The Achilles Argument presumes that space and time are infinitely divisible. So, Zeno's conclusion may not simply have been that Achilles cannot catch the tortoise but instead that he cannot catch the tortoise if space and time are infinitely divisible. Perhaps, as some commentators have speculated, Zeno used the Achilles only to attack continuous space, and he intended his other paradoxes such as "The Moving Rows" to attack discrete space. The historical record is not clear. Notice that, although space and time are infinitely divisible for Zeno, he did not have the concepts to properly describe the limit of the infinite division. Neither Zeno nor any of the other ancient Greeks had the concept of a dimensionless point; they did  not even have the concept of zero. However, today's versions of Zeno's Paradoxes can and do use those concepts.

ii. The Dichotomy (The Racetrack)

In his Progressive Dichotomy Paradox, Zeno argued that a runner will never reach the stationary goal line of a racetrack. The reason is that the runner must first reach half the distance to the goal, but when there he must still cross half the remaining distance to the goal, but having done that the runner must cover half of the new remainder, and so on. If the goal is one meter away, the runner must cover a distance of 1/2 meter, then 1/4 meter, then 1/8 meter, and so on ad infinitum. The runner cannot reach the final goal, says Zeno. Why not? There are few traces of Zeno's reasoning here, but for reconstructions that give the strongest reasoning, we may say that the runner will not reach the final goal because there is too far to run, the sum is actually infinite. The Standard Solution argues instead that the sum of this infinite geometric series is one, not infinity.

The problem of the runner getting to the goal can be viewed from a different perspective. According to the Regressive version of the Dichotomy Paradox, the runner cannot even take a first step. Here is why. Any step may be divided conceptually into a first half and a second half. Before taking a full step, the runner must take a 1/2 step, but before that he must take a 1/4 step, but before that a 1/8 step, and so forth ad infinitum, so Achilles will never get going. Like the Achilles Paradox, this paradox also concludes that any motion is impossible. The original source is Aristotle (Physics, 239b11-13).

The Dichotomy paradox, in either its Progressive version or its Regressive version, assumes for the sake of simplicity that the runner’s positions are point places. Actual runners take up some larger volume, but assuming point places is not a controversial assumption because Zeno could have reconstructed his paradox by speaking of the point places occupied by, say, the tip of the runner’s nose, and this assumption makes for a strong paradox than assuming the runner's position are larger.

In the Dichotomy Paradox, the runner reaches the points 1/2 and 3/4 and 7/8 and so forth on the way to his goal, but under the influence of Bolzano and Dedekind and Cantor, who developed the first theory of sets, the set of those points is no longer considered to be potentially infinite. It is an actually infinite set of points abstracted from a continuum of points–in the contemporary sense of “continuum” at the heart of calculus. And the ancient idea that the actually infinite series of path lengths or segments 1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + … is infinite had to be rejected in favor of the new theory that it converges to 1. This is key to solving the Dichotomy Paradox, according to the Standard Solution. It is basically the same treatment as that given to the Achilles. The Dichotomy Paradox has been called “The Stadium” by some commentators, but that name is also commonly used for the Paradox of the Moving Rows.

Aristotle, in Physics Z9, said of the Dichotomy that it is possible for a runner to come in contact with a potentially infinite number of things in a finite time provided the time intervals becomes shorter and shorter. Aristotle said Zeno assumed this is impossible, and that is one of his errors in the Dichotomy. However, Aristotle merely asserted this and could give no detailed theory that enables the computation of the finite amount of time. So, Aristotle could not really defend his diagnosis of Zeno's error. Today the calculus is used to provide the Standard Solution with that detailed theory.

There is another detail of the Dichotomy that needs resolution. How does Zeno complete the trip if there is no final step or last member of the infinite sequence of steps (intervals and goals)? Don't trips need last steps? The Standard Solution answers "no" and says the intuitive answer "yes" is one of our many intuitions that must be rejected when embracing the Standard Solution.

iii. The Arrow

Zeno’s Arrow Paradox takes a different approach to challenging the coherence of our common sense concepts of time and motion. As Aristotle explains, from Zeno’s “assumption that time is composed of moments,” a moving arrow must occupy a space equal to itself during any moment. That is, during any moment it is at the place where it is. But places do not move. So, if in each moment, the arrow is occupying a space equal to itself, then the arrow is not moving in that moment because it has no time in which to move; it is simply there at the place. The same holds for any other moment during the so-called “flight” of the arrow. So, the arrow is never moving. Similarly, nothing else moves. The source for Zeno’s argument is Aristotle (Physics, 239b5-32).

The Standard Solution to the Arrow Paradox uses the “at-at” theory of motion, which says motion is being at different places at different times and that being at rest involves being motionless at a particular point at a particular time. The difference between rest and motion has to do with what is happening at nearby moments and has nothing to do with what is happening during a moment. An object cannot be in motion in or during an instant, but it can be in motion at an instant in the sense of having a speed at that instant, provided the object occupies different positions at times before or after that instant so that the instant is part of a period in which the arrow is continuously in motion. If we don't pay attention to what happens at nearby instants, it is impossible to distinguish instantaneous motion from instantaneous rest, but distinguishing the two is the way out of the Arrow Paradox. Zeno would have balked at the idea of motion at an instant, and Aristotle explicitly denied it. The Arrow Paradox seems especially strong to someone who would say that motion is an intrinsic property of an instant, being some propensity or disposition to be elsewhere.

In standard calculus, speed of an object at an instant (instantaneous velocity) is the time derivative of the object's position; this means the object's speed is the limit of its speeds during arbitrarily small intervals of time containing the instant. Equivalently, we say the object's speed is the limit of its speed over an interval as the length of the interval tends to zero. The derivative of position x with respect to time t, namely dx/dt, is the arrow’s speed, and it has non-zero values at specific places at specific instants during the flight, contra Zeno and Aristotle. The speed during an instant or in an instant, which is what Zeno is calling for, would be 0/0 and so be undefined. Using these modern concepts, Zeno cannot successfully argue that at each moment the arrow is at rest or that the speed of the arrow is zero at every instant. Therefore, advocates of the Standard Solution conclude that Zeno’s Arrow Paradox has a false, but crucial, assumption and so is unsound.

Independently of Zeno, the Arrow Paradox was discovered by the Chinese dialectician Kung-sun Lung (Gongsun Long, ca. 325–250 B.C.E.). A lingering philosophical question about the arrow paradox is whether there is a way to properly refute Zeno's argument that motion is impossible without using the apparatus of calculus.

iv. The Moving Rows (The Stadium)

It takes a body moving at a given speed a certain amount of time to traverse a body of a fixed length. Passing the body again at that speed will take the same amount of time, provided the body’s length stays fixed. Zeno challenged this common reasoning. According to Aristotle (Physics 239b33-240a18), Zeno considered bodies of equal length aligned along three parallel racetracks within a stadium. One track contains A bodies (three A bodies are shown below); another contains B bodies; and a third contains C bodies. Each body is the same distance from its neighbors along its track. The A bodies are stationary, but the Bs are moving to the right, and the Cs are moving with the same speed to the left. Here are two snapshots of the situation, before and after.

Diagram of Zeno's Moving Rows

Zeno points out that, in the time between the before-snapshot and the after-snapshot, the leftmost C passes two Bs but only one A, contradicting the common sense assumption that the C should take longer to pass two Bs than one A. The usual way out of this paradox is to remark that Zeno mistakenly supposes that a moving body passes both moving and stationary objects with equal speed.

Aristotle argues that how long it takes to pass a body depends on the speed of the body; for example, if the body is coming towards you, then you can pass it in less time than if it is stationary. Today’s analysts agree with Aristotle’s diagnosis, and historically this paradox of motion has seemed weaker than the previous three. This paradox is also called “The Stadium,” but occasionally so is the Dichotomy Paradox.

Some analysts, such as Tannery (1887), believe Zeno may have had in mind that the paradox was supposed to have assumed that space and time are discrete (quantized, atomized) as opposed to continuous, and Zeno intended his argument to challenge the coherence of this assumption about discrete space and time. Well, the paradox could be interpreted this way. Assume the three objects are adjacent to each other in their tracks or spaces; that is, the middle object is only one atom of space away from its neighbors. Then, if the Cs were moving at a speed of, say, one atom of space in one atom of time, the leftmost C would pass two atoms of B-space in the time it passed one atom of A-space, which is a contradiction to our assumption that the Cs move at a rate of one atom of space in one atom of time. Or else we’d have to say that in that atom of time, the leftmost C somehow got beyond two Bs by passing only one of them, which is also absurd (according to Zeno). Interpreted this way, Zeno’s argument produces a challenge to the idea that space and time are discrete. However, most commentators believe Zeno himself did not interpret his paradox this way.

b. Paradoxes of Plurality

Zeno's paradoxes of motion are attacks on the commonly held belief that motion is real, but because motion is a kind of plurality, namely a process along a plurality of places in a plurality of times, they are also attacks on this kind of plurality. Zeno offered more direct attacks on all kinds of plurality. The first is his Paradox of Alike and Unlike.

i. Alike and Unlike

According to Plato in Parmenides 127-9, Zeno argued that the assumption of plurality–the assumption that there are many things–leads to a contradiction. He quotes Zeno as saying: "If things are many, . . . they must be both like and unlike. But that is impossible; unlike things cannot be like, nor like things unlike" (Hamilton and Cairns (1961), 922).

Zeno's point is this. Consider a plurality of things, such as some people and some mountains. These things have in common the property of being heavy. But if they all have this property in common, then they really are all the same kind of thing, and so are not a plurality. They are a one. By this reasoning, Zeno believes it has been shown that the plurality is one (or the many is not many), which is a contradiction. Therefore, by reductio ad absurdum, there is no plurality, as Parmenides has always claimed.

Plato immediately accuses Zeno of equivocating. A thing can be alike some other thing in one respect while being not alike it in a different respect. Your having a property in common with some other thing does not make you identical with that other thing. Consider again our plurality of people and mountains. People and mountains are all alike in being heavy, but are unlike in intelligence. And they are unlike in being mountains; the mountains are mountains, but the people are not. As Plato says, when Zeno tries to conclude "that the same thing is many and one, we shall [instead] say that what he is proving is that something is many and one [in different respects], not that unity is many or that plurality is one...." [129d] So, there is no contradiction, and the paradox is solved by Plato. This paradox is generally considered to be one of Zeno's weakest paradoxes, and it is now rarely discussed. [See Rescher (2001), pp. 94-6 for some discussion.]

ii. Limited and Unlimited

This paradox is also called the Paradox of Denseness. Suppose there exist many things rather than, as Parmenides would say, just one thing. Then there will be a definite or fixed number of those many things, and so they will be “limited.” But if there are many things, say two things, then they must be distinct, and to keep them distinct there must be a third thing separating them. So, there are three things. But between these, …. In other words, things are dense and there is no definite or fixed number of them, so they will be “unlimited.” This is a contradiction, because the plurality would be both limited and unlimited. Therefore, there are no pluralities; there exists only one thing, not many things. This argument is reconstructed from Zeno’s own words, as quoted by Simplicius in his commentary of book 1 of Aristotle’s Physics.

According to the Standard Solution to this paradox, the weakness of Zeno’s argument can be said to lie in the assumption that “to keep them distinct, there must be a third thing separating them.” Zeno would have been correct to say that between any two physical objects that are separated in space, there is a place between them, because space is dense, but he is mistaken to claim that there must be a third physical object there between them. Two objects can be distinct at a time simply by one having a property the other does not have.

iii. Large and Small

Suppose there exist many things rather than, as Parmenides says, just one thing. Then every part of any plurality is both so small as to have no size but also so large as to be infinite, says Zeno. His reasoning for why they have no size has been lost, but many commentators suggest that he’d reason as follows. If there is a plurality, then it must be composed of parts which are not themselves pluralities. Yet things that are not pluralities cannot have a size or else they’d be divisible into parts and thus be pluralities themselves.

Now, why are the parts of pluralities so large as to be infinite? Well, the parts cannot be so small as to have no size since adding such things together would never contribute anything to the whole so far as size is concerned. So, the parts have some non-zero size. If so, then each of these parts will have two spatially distinct sub-parts, one in front of the other. Each of these sub-parts also will have a size. The front part, being a thing, will have its own two spatially distinct sub-parts, one in front of the other; and these two sub-parts will have sizes. Ditto for the back part. And so on without end. A sum of all these sub-parts would be infinite. Therefore, each part of a plurality will be so large as to be infinite.

This sympathetic reconstruction of the argument is based on Simplicius’ On Aristotle’s Physics, where Simplicius quotes Zeno’s own words for part of the paradox, although he does not say what he is quotingfrom.

There are many errors here in Zeno’s reasoning, according to the Standard Solution. He is mistaken at the beginning when he says, “If there is a plurality, then it must be composed of parts which are not themselves pluralities.” A university is an illustrative counterexample. A university is a plurality of students, but we need not rule out the possibility that a student is a plurality. What’s a whole and what’s a plurality depends on our purposes. When we consider a university to be a plurality of students, we consider the students to be wholes without parts. But for another purpose we might want to say that a student is a plurality of biological cells. Zeno is confused about this notion of relativity, and about part-whole reasoning; and as commentators began to appreciate this they lost interest in Zeno as a player in the great metaphysical debate between pluralism and monism.

A second error occurs in arguing that the each part of a plurality must have a non-zero size. In 1901, Henri Lebesgue showed how to properly define the measure function so that a line segment has nonzero measure even though (the singleton set of) any point has a zero measure. The measure of the line segment [a,  b] is b - a; the measure of a cube with side a is a3. Lebesgue’s theory is our current civilization’s theory of measure, and thus of length, volume, duration, mass, voltage, brightness, and other continuous magnitudes.

Thanks to Aristotle’s support, Zeno’s Paradoxes of Large and Small and of Infinite Divisibility (to be discussed below) were generally considered to have shown that a continuous magnitude cannot be composed of points. Interest was rekindled in this topic in the 18th century. The physical objects in Newton’s classical mechanics of 1726 were interpreted by R. J. Boscovich in 1763 as being collections of point masses. Each point mass is a movable point carrying a fixed mass. This idealization of continuous bodies as if they were compositions of point particles was very fruitful; it could be used to easily solve otherwise very difficult problems in physics. This success led scientists, mathematicians, and philosophers to recognize that the strength of Zeno’s Paradoxes of Large and Small and of Infinite Divisibility had been overestimated; they did not prevent a continuous magnitude from being composed of points.

iv. Infinite Divisibility

This is the most challenging of all the paradoxes of plurality. Consider the difficulties that arise if we assume that an object theoretically can be divided into a plurality of parts. According to Zeno, there is a reassembly problem. Imagine cutting the object into two non-overlapping parts, then similarly cutting these parts into parts, and so on until the process of repeated division is complete. Assuming the hypothetical division is “exhaustive” or does comes to an end, then at the end we reach what Zeno calls “the elements.” Here there is a problem about reassembly. There are three possibilities. (1) The elements are nothing. In that case the original objects will be a composite of nothing, and so the whole object will be a mere appearance, which is absurd. (2) The elements are something, but they have zero size. So, the original object is composed of elements of zero size. Adding an infinity of zeros yields a zero sum, so the original object had no size, which is absurd. (3) The elements are something, but they do not have zero size. If so, these can be further divided, and the process of division was not complete after all, which contradicts our assumption that the process was already complete. In summary, there were three possibilities, but all three possibilities lead to absurdity. So, objects are not divisible into a plurality of parts.

Simplicius says this argument is due to Zeno even though it is in Aristotle (On Generation and Corruption, 316a15-34, 316b34 and 325a8-12) and is not attributed there to Zeno, which is odd. Aristotle says the argument convinced the atomists to reject infinite divisibility. The argument has been called the Paradox of Parts and Wholes, but it has no traditional name.

The Standard Solution says we first should ask Zeno to be clearer about what he is dividing. Is it concrete or abstract? When dividing a concrete, material stick into its components, we reach ultimate constituents of matter such as quarks and electrons that cannot be further divided. These have a size, a zero size (according to quantum electrodynamics), but it is incorrect to conclude that the whole stick has no size if its constituents have zero size. [Due to the forces involved, point particles have finite “cross sections,” and configurations of those particles, such as atoms, do have finite size.] So, Zeno is wrong here. On the other hand, is Zeno dividing an abstract path or trajectory? Let's assume he is, since this produces a more challenging paradox. If so, then choice (2) above is the one to think about. It's the one that talks about addition of zeroes. Let's assume the object is one-dimensional, like a path. According to the Standard Solution, this "object" that gets divided should be considered to be a continuum with its elements arranged into the order type of the linear continuum, and we should use Lebesgue's notion of measure to find the size of the object. The size (length, measure) of a point-element is zero, but Zeno is mistaken in saying the total size (length, measure) of all the zero-size elements is zero. The size of the object  is determined instead by the difference in coordinate numbers assigned to the end points of the object. An object extending along a straight line that has one of its end points at one meter from the origin and other end point at three meters from the origin has a size of two meters and not zero meters. So, there is no reassembly problem, and a crucial step in Zeno's argument breaks down.

c. Other Paradoxes

i. The Grain of Millet

There are two common interpretations of this paradox. According to the first, which is the standard interpretation, when a bushel of millet (or wheat) grains falls out of its container and crashes to the floor, it makes a sound. Since the bushel is composed of individual grains, each individual grain also makes a sound, as should each thousandth part of the grain, and so on to its ultimate parts. But this result contradicts the fact that we actually hear no sound for portions like a thousandth part of a grain, and so we surely would hear no sound for an ultimate part of a grain. Yet, how can the bushel make a sound if none of its ultimate parts make a sound? The original source of this argument is Aristotle Physics (250a.19-21). There seems to be appeal to the iterative rule that if a millet or millet part makes a sound, then so should a next smaller part.

We do not have Zeno’s words on what conclusion we are supposed to draw from this. Perhaps he would conclude it is a mistake to suppose that whole bushels of millet have millet parts. This is an attack on plurality.

The Standard Solution to this interpretation of the paradox accuses Zeno of mistakenly assuming that there is no lower bound on the size of something that can make a sound. There is no problem, we now say, with parts having very different properties from the wholes that they constitute. The iterative rule is initially plausible but ultimately not trustworthy, and Zeno is committing both the fallacy of division and the fallacy of composition.

Some analysts interpret Zeno’s paradox a second way, as challenging our trust in our sense of hearing, as follows. When a bushel of millet grains crashes to the floor, it makes a sound. The bushel is composed of individual grains, so they, too, make an audible sound. But if you drop an individual millet grain or a small part of one or an even smaller part, then eventually your hearing detects no sound, even though there is one. Therefore, you cannot trust your sense of hearing.

This reasoning about our not detecting low amplitude sounds is similar to making the mistake of arguing that you cannot trust your thermometer because there are some ranges of temperature that it is not sensitive to. So, on this second interpretation, the paradox is also easy to solve. One reason given in the literature for believing that this second interpretation is not the one that Zeno had in mind is that Aristotle’s criticism given below applies to the first interpretation and not the second, and it is unlikely that Aristotle would have misinterpreted the paradox.

ii. Against Place

Given an object, we may assume that there is a single, correct answer to the question, “What is its place?” Because everything that exists has a place, and because place itself exists, so it also must have a place, and so on forever. That’s too many places, so there is a contradiction. The original source is Aristotle’sPhysics (209a23-25 and 210b22-24).

The standard response to Zeno’s Paradox Against Place is to deny that places have places, and to point out that the notion of place should be relative to reference frame. But Zeno’s assumption that places have places was common in ancient Greece at the time, and Zeno is to be praised for showing that it is a faulty assumption.

4. Aristotle’s Treatment of the Paradoxes

Aristotle’s views about Zeno’s paradoxes can be found in Physics, book 4, chapter 2, and book 6, chapters 2 and 9. Regarding the Dichotomy Paradox, Aristotle is to be applauded for his insight that Achilles has time to reach his goal because during the run ever shorter paths take correspondingly ever shorter times.

Aristotle had several criticisms of Zeno. Regarding the paradoxes of motion, he complained that Zeno should not suppose the runner's path is dependent on its parts; instead, the path is there first, and the parts are constructed by the analyst. His second complaint was that Zeno should not suppose that lines contain points. Aristotle's third and most influential, critical idea involves a complaint about potential infinity. On this point, in remarking about the Achilles Paradox, Aristotle said, “Zeno’s argument makes a false assumption in asserting that it is impossible for a thing to pass over…infinite things in a finite time.” Aristotle believes it is impossible for a thing to pass over an actually infinite number of things in a finite time, but that it is possible for a thing to pass over a potentially infinite number of things in a finite time. Here is how Aristotle expressed the point:

For motion…, although what is continuous contains an infinite number of halves, they are not actual but potential halves. (Physics 263a25-27). …Therefore to the question whether it is possible to pass through an infinite number of units either of time or of distance we must reply that in a sense it is and in a sense it is not. If the units are actual, it is not possible: if they are potential, it is possible. (Physics 263b2-5).

Actual infinities are also called completed infinities. A potential infinity could never become an actual infinity. Aristotle believed the concept of actual infinity is perhaps not coherent, and so not real either in mathematics or in nature. He believes that actual infinities are not real because, if one were to exist, its infinity of parts would have to exist all at once, which he believed is impossible. Potential infinities exist over time, as processes that always can be continued at a later time. That's the only kind of infinity that could be real, thought Aristotle. A potential infinity is an unlimited iteration of some operation—unlimited in time. Aristotle claimed correctly that if Zeno were not to have used the concept of actual infinity, the paradoxes of motion such as the Achilles Paradox (and the Dichotomy Paradox) could not be created.

Here is why doing so is a way out of these paradoxes. Zeno said that to go from the start to the finish line, the runner Achilles must reach the place that is halfway-there, then after arriving at this place he still must reach the place that is half of that remaining distance, and after arriving there he must again reach the new place that is now halfway to the goal, and so on. These are too many places to reach. Zeno made the mistake, according to Aristotle, of supposing that this infinite process needs completing when it really does not; the finitely long path from start to finish exists undivided for the runner, and it is the mathematician who is demanding the completion of such a process. Without that concept of a completed infinity there is no paradox. Aristotle is correct about this being a treatment that avoids paradox. Today’s standard treatment of the Achilles paradox disagrees with Aristotle's way out of the paradox and says Zeno was correct to use the concept of a completed infinity and to imply the runner must go to an actual infinity of places in a finite time.

From what Aristotle says, one can infer between the lines that he believes there is another reason to reject actual infinities: doing so is the only way out of these paradoxes of motion. Today we know better. There is another way out, namely, the Standard Solution that uses actual infinities, namely Cantor's transfinite sets.

Aristotle’s treatment by disallowing actual infinity while allowing potential infinity was clever, and it satisfied nearly all scholars for 1,500 years, being buttressed during that time by the Church's doctrine that only God is actually infinite. George Berkeley, Immanuel Kant, Carl Friedrich Gauss, and Henri Poincaré were influential defenders of potential infinity. Leibniz accepted actual infinitesimals, but other mathematicians and physicists in European universities during these centuries were careful to distinguish between actual and potential infinities and to avoid using actual infinities.

Given 1,500 years of opposition to actual infinities, the burden of proof was on anyone advocating them. Bernard Bolzano and Georg Cantor accepted this burden in the 19th century. The key idea is to see a potentially infinite set as a variable quantity that is dependent on being abstracted from a pre-exisiting actually infinite set. Bolzano argued that the natural numbers should be conceived of as a set, a determinate set, not one with a variable number of elements. Cantor argued that any potential infinity must be interpreted as varying over a predefined fixed set of possible values, a set that is actually infinite. He put it this way:

In order for there to be a variable quantity in some mathematical study, the “domain” of its variability must strictly speaking be known beforehand through a definition. However, this domain cannot itself be something variable…. Thus this “domain” is a definite, actually infinite set of values. Thus each potential infinite…presupposes an actual infinite. (Cantor 1887)

From this standpoint, Dedekind’s 1872 axiom of continuity and his definition of real numbers as certain infinite subsets of rational numbers suggested to Cantor and then to many other mathematicians that arbitrarily large sets of rational numbers are most naturally seen to be subsets of an actually infinite set of rational numbers. The same can be said for sets of real numbers. An actually infinite set is what we today call a "transfinite set." Cantor's idea is then to treat a potentially infinite set as being a sequence of definite subsets of a transfinite set. Aristotle had said mathematicians need only the concept of a finite straight line that may be produced as far as they wish, or divided as finely as they wish, but Cantor would say that this way of thinking presupposes a completed infinite continuum from which that finite line is abstracted at any particular time.

[When Cantor says the mathematical concept of potential infinity presupposes the mathematical concept of actual infinity, this does not imply that, if future time were to be potentially infinite, then future time also would be actually infinite.]

Dedekind's primary contribution to our topic was to give the first rigorous definition of infinite set—an actual infinity—showing that the notion is useful and not self-contradictory. Cantor provided the missing ingredient—that the mathematical line can fruitfully be treated as a dense linear ordering of uncountably many points, and he went on to develop set theory and to give the continuum a set-theoretic basis which convinced mathematicians that the concept was rigorously defined.

These ideas now form the basis of modern real analysis. The implication for the Achilles and Dichotomy paradoxes is that, once the rigorous definition of a linear continuum is in place, and once we have Cauchy’s rigorous theory of how to assess the value of an infinite series, then we can point to the successful use of calculus in physical science, especially in the treatment of time and of motion through space, and say that the sequence of intervals or paths described by Zeno is most properly treated as a sequence of subsets of an actually infinite set [that is, Aristotle's potential infinity of places that Achilles reaches are really a variable subset of an already existing actually infinite set of point places], and we can be confident that Aristotle’s treatment of the paradoxes is inferior to the Standard Solution’s.

Zeno said Achilles cannot achieve his goal in a finite time, but there is no record of the details of how he defended this conclusion. He might have said the reason is (i) that there is no last goal in the sequence of sub-goals, or, perhaps (ii) that it would take too long to achieve all the sub-goals, or perhaps (iii) that covering all the sub-paths is too great a distance to run. Zeno might have offered all these defenses. In attacking justification (ii), Aristotle objects that, if Zeno were to confine his notion of infinity to a potential infinity and were to reject the idea of zero-length sub-paths, then Achilles achieves his goal in a finite time, so this is a way out of the paradox. However, an advocate of the Standard Solution says Achilles achieves his goal by covering an actual infinity of paths in a finite time, and this is the way out of the paradox. (The discussion of whether Achilles can properly be described as completing an actual infinity of tasks rather than goals will be considered in Section 5c.) Aristotle's treatment of the paradoxes is basically criticized for being inconsistent with current standard real analysis that is based upon Zermelo Fraenkel set theory and its actually infinite sets. To summarize the errors of Zeno and Aristotle in the Achilles Paradox and in the Dichotomy Paradox, they both made the mistake of thinking that if a runner has to cover an actually infinite number of sub-paths to reach his goal, then he will never reach it; calculus shows how Achilles can do this and reach his goal in a finite time, and the fruitfulness of the tools of calculus imply that the Standard Solution is a better treatment than Aristotle's.

Let’s turn to the other paradoxes. In proposing his treatment of the Paradox of the Large and Small and of the Paradox of Infinite Divisibility, Aristotle said that

…a line cannot be composed of points, the line being continuous and the point indivisible. (Physics, 231a 25)

In modern real analysis, a continuum is composed of points, but Aristotle, ever the advocate of common sense reasoning, claimed that a continuum cannot be composed of points. Aristotle believed a line can be composed only of smaller, indefinitely divisible lines and not of points without magnitude. Similarly a distance cannot be composed of point places and a duration cannot be composed of instants. This is one of Aristotle’s key errors, according to advocates of the Standard Solution, because by maintaining this common sense view he created an obstacle to the fruitful development of real analysis. In addition to complaining about points, Aristotelians object to the idea of an actual infinite number of them.

In his analysis of the Arrow Paradox, Aristotle said Zeno mistakenly assumes time is composed of indivisible moments, but “This is false, for time is not composed of indivisible moments any more than any other magnitude is composed of indivisibles.” (Physics, 239b8-9) Zeno needs those instantaneous moments; that way Zeno can say the arrow does not move during the moment. Aristotle recommends not allowing Zeno to appeal to instantaneous moments and restricting Zeno to saying motion be divided only into a potential infinity of intervals. That restriction implies the arrow’s path can be divided only into finitely many intervals at any time. So, at any time, there is a finite interval during which the arrow can exhibit motion by changing location. So the arrow flies, after all. That is, Aristotle declares Zeno’s argument is based on false assumptions without which there is no problem with the arrow’s motion. However, the Standard Solution agrees with Zeno that time can be composed of indivisible moments or instants, and it implies that Aristotle has mis-diagnosed where the error lies in the Arrow Paradox. Advocates of the Standard Solution would add that allowing a duration to be composed of indivisible moments is what is needed for having a fruitful calculus, and Aristotle's recommendation is an obstacle to the development of calculus.

Aristotle’s treatment of The Paradox of the Moving Rows is basically in agreement with the Standard Solution to that paradox–that Zeno did not appreciate the difference between speed and relative speed.

Regarding the Paradox of the Grain of Millet, Aristotle said that parts need not have all the properties of the whole, and so grains need not make sounds just because bushels of grains do. (Physics, 250a, 22) And if the parts make no sounds, we should not conclude that the whole can make no sound. It would have been helpful for Aristotle to have said more about what are today called the Fallacies of Division and Composition that Zeno is committing. However, Aristotle’s response to the Grain of Millet is brief but accurate by today’s standards.

In conclusion, are there two adequate but different solutions to Zeno’s paradoxes, Aristotle’s Solution and the Standard Solution? No. Aristotle’s treatment does not stand up to criticism in a manner that most scholars deem adequate. The Standard Solution uses contemporary concepts that have proved to be more valuable for solving and resolving so many other problems in mathematics and physics. Replacing Aristotle’s common sense concepts with the new concepts from real analysis and classical mechanics has been a key ingredient in the successful development of mathematics and science in recent centuries, and for this reason the vast majority of scientists, mathematicians, and philosophers reject Aristotle's treatment. Nevertheless, there is a significant minority in the philosophical community who do not agree, as we shall see in the sections that follow.

5. Other Issues Involving the Paradoxes

a. Consequences of Accepting the Standard Solution

There is a price to pay for accepting the Standard Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes. The following–once presumably safe–intuitions or assumptions must be rejected:

  1. A continuum is too smooth to be divisible into point elements.
  2. Runners do not have time to go to an actual infinity of places in a finite time.
  3. The sum of an infinite series of positive terms is always infinite.
  4. For each instant there is a next instant and for each place along a line there is a next place.
  5. A finite distance along a line cannot contain an actually infinite number of points.
  6. The more points there are on a line, the longer the line is.
  7. It is absurd for there to be numbers that are bigger than every integer.
  8. A one-dimensional curve can not fill a two-dimensional area, nor can an infinitely long curve enclose a finite area.
  9. A whole is always greater than any of its parts.

Item (8) was undermined when it was discovered that the continuum implies the existence of fractal curves. However, the loss of intuition (1) has caused the greatest stir because so many philosophers object to a continuum being constructed from points. The Austrian philosopher Franz Brentano believed with Aristotle that scientific theories should be literal descriptions of reality, as opposed to today’s more popular view that theories are idealizations or approximations of reality. Continuity is something given in perception, said Brentano, and not in a mathematical construction; therefore, mathematics misrepresents. In a 1905 letter to Husserl, he said, “I regard it as absurd to interpret a continuum as a set of points.”

But the Standard Solution needs to be thought of as a package to be evaluated in terms of all of its costs and benefits. From this perspective the Standard Solution’s point-set analysis of continua has withstood the criticism and demonstrated its value in mathematics and mathematical physics. As a consequence, advocates of the Standard Solution say we must live with rejecting the eight intuitions listed above, and accept the counterintuitive implications such as there being divisible continua, infinite sets of different sizes, and space-filling curves. They agree with the philosopher W. V .O. Quine who demands that we be conservative when revising the system of claims that we believe and who recommends “minimum mutilation.” Advocates of the Standard Solution say no less mutilation will work satisfactorily.

b. Criticisms of the Standard Solution

Balking at having to reject so many of our intuitions, the 20th century philosophers Henri-Louis Bergson, Max Black, Franz Brentano, L. E. J. Brouwer, Solomon Feferman, William James, James Thomson, and Alfred North Whitehead argued in different ways that the standard mathematical account of continuity does not apply to physical processes, or is improper for describing those processes. Here are their main reasons: (1) the actual infinite cannot be encountered in experience and thus is unreal, (2) human intelligence is not capable of understanding motion, (3) the sequence of tasks that Achilles performs is finite and the illusion that it is infinite is due to mathematicians who confuse their mathematical representations with what is represented. (4) motion is unitary even though its spatial trajectory is infinitely divisible, (5) treating time as being made of instants is to treat time as static rather than as the dynamic aspect of consciousness that it truly is, (6) actual infinities and the contemporary continuum are not indispensable to solving the paradoxes, and (7) the Standard Solution’s implicit assumption of the primacy of the coherence of the sciences is unjustified because coherence with a priori knowledge and common sense is primary.

See Salmon (1970, Introduction) and Feferman (1998) for a discussion of the controversy about the quality of Zeno’s arguments, and an introduction to its vast literature. This controversy is much less actively pursued in today’s mathematical literature, and hardly at all in today’s scientific literature. A minority of philosophers are actively involved in an attempt to retain one or more of the eight intuitions listed in section 5a above. An important philosophical issue is whether the paradoxes should be solved by the Standard Solution or instead by assuming that a line is not composed of points but of intervals, and whether use of infinitesimals is essential to a proper understanding of the paradoxes.

c. Supertasks and Infinity Machines

Zeno’s Paradox of Achilles was presented as implying that he will never catch the tortoise because the sequence of goals to be achieved has no final member. In that presentation, use of the terms “task” and “act” was intentionally avoided, but there are interesting questions that do use those terms. In reaching the tortoise, Achilles does not cover an infinite distance, but he does cover an infinite number of distances. In doing so, does he need to complete an infinite sequence of tasks or actions? In other words, assuming Achilles does complete the task of reaching the tortoise, does he thereby complete a supertask, a transfinite number of tasks in a finite time?

Bertrand Russell said “yes.” He argued that it is possible to perform a task in one-half minute, then perform another task in the next quarter-minute, and so on, for a full minute. At the end of the minute, an infinite number of tasks would have been performed. In fact, Achilles does this in catching the tortoise. In the mid-twentieth century, Hermann Weyl, Max Black, and others objected, and thus began an ongoing controversy about the number of tasks that can be completed in a finite time.

That controversy has sparked a related discussion about whether there could be a machine that can perform an infinite number of tasks in a finite time. A machine that can is called an infinity machine. In 1954, in an effort to undermine Russell’s argument, the philosopher James Thomson described a lamp that is intended to be a typical infinity machine. Let the machine switch the lamp on for a half-minute; then switch it off for a quarter-minute; then on for an eighth-minute; off for a sixteenth-minute; and so on. Would the lamp be lit or dark at the end of minute? Thomson argued that it must be one or the other, but it cannot be either because every period in which it is off is followed by a period in which it is on, and vice versa, so there can be no such lamp, and the specific mistake in the reasoning was to suppose that it is logically possible to perform a supertask. The implication for Zeno’s paradoxes is that, although Thomson is not denying Achilles catches the tortoise, he is denying Russell’s description of Achilles’ task as being the completion of an infinite number of sub-tasks in a finite time.

Paul Benacerraf (1962) complains that Thomson’s reasoning is faulty because it fails to notice that the initial description of the lamp determines the state of the lamp at each period in the sequence of switching, but it determines nothing about the state of the lamp at the limit of the sequence. The lamp could be either on or off at the limit. The limit of the infinite converging sequence is not in the sequence. So, Thomson has not established the logical impossibility of completing this supertask.

Could some other argument establish this impossibility? Benacerraf suggests that an answer depends on what we ordinarily mean by the term “completing a task.” If the meaning does not require that tasks have minimum times for their completion, then maybe Russell is right that some supertasks can be completed, he says; but if a minimum time is always required, then Russell is mistaken because an infinite time would be required. What is needed is a better account of the meaning of the term “task.” Grünbaum objects to Benacerraf’s reliance on ordinary meaning. “We need to heed the commitments of ordinary language,” says Grünbaum, “only to the extent of guarding against being victimized or stultified by them.”

The Thomson Lamp has generated a great literature in recent philosophy. Here are some of the issues. What is the proper definition of “task”? For example, does it require a minimum amount of time, and does it require a minimum amount of work, in the physicists’ technical sense of that term? Even if it is physically impossible to flip the switch in Thomson’s lamp, suppose physics were different and there were no limit on speed; what then? Is the lamp logically impossible? Is the lamp metaphysically impossible, even if it is logically possible? Was it proper of Thomson to suppose that the question of whether the lamp is lit or dark at the end of the minute must have a determinate answer? Does Thomson’s question have no answer, given the initial description of the situation, or does it have an answer which we are unable to compute? Should we conclude that it makes no sense to divide a finite task into an infinite number of ever shorter sub-tasks? Even if completing a countable infinity of tasks in a finite time is physically possible (such as when Achilles runs to the tortoise), is completing an uncountable infinity also possible? Interesting issues arise when we bring in Einstein’s theory of relativity and consider a bifurcated supertask. This is an infinite sequence of tasks in a finite interval of an external observer’s proper time, but not in the machine’s own proper time. See Earman and Norton (1996) for an introduction to the extensive literature on these topics. Unfortunately, there is no agreement in the philosophical community on most of the questions we’ve just entertained.

d. Constructivism

The spirit of Aristotle’s opposition to actual infinities persists today in the philosophy of mathematics called constructivism. Constructivism is not a precisely defined position, but it implies that acceptable mathematical objects and procedures have to be founded on constructions and not, say, on assuming the object does not exist, then deducing a contradiction from that assumption. Most constructivists believe acceptable constructions must be performable ideally by humans independently of practical limitations of time or money. So they would say potential infinities, recursive functions, mathematical induction, and Cantor’s diagonal argument are constructive, but the following are not: The axiom of choice, the law of excluded middle, the law of double negation, completed infinities, and the classical continuum of the Standard Solution. The implication is that Zeno’s Paradoxes were not solved correctly by using the methods of the Standard Solution. More conservative constructionists, the finitists, would go even further and reject potential infinities because of the human being's finite computational resources, but this conservative sub-group of constructivists is very much out of favor.

L. E. J. Brouwer’s intuitionism was the leading constructivist theory of the early 20th century. In response to suspicions raised by the discovery of Russell’s Paradox and the introduction into set theory of the controversial non-constructive axiom of choice, Brouwer attempted to place mathematics on what he believed to be a firmer epistemological foundation by arguing that mathematical concepts are admissible only if they can be constructed from, and thus grounded in, an ideal mathematician’s vivid temporal intuitions, the a priori intuitions of time. Brouwer’s intuitionistic continuum has the Aristotelian property of unsplitability. What this means is that, unlike the Standard Solution’s set-theoretic composition of the continuum which allows, say, the closed interval of real numbers from zero to one to be split or cut into (that is, be the union of sets of) those numbers in the interval that are less than one-half and those numbers in the interval that are greater than or equal to one-half, the corresponding closed interval of the intuitionistic continuum cannot be split this way into two disjoint sets. This unsplitability or inseparability agrees in spirit with Aristotle’s idea of the continuity of a real continuum, but disagrees in spirit with Aristotle by allowing the continuum to be composed of points. [Posy (2005) 346-7]

Although everyone agrees that any legitimate mathematical proof must use only a finite number of steps and be constructive in that sense, the majority of mathematicians in the first half of the twentieth century claimed that constructive mathematics could not produce an adequate theory of the continuum because essential theorems will no longer be theorems, and constructivist principles and procedures are too awkward to use successfully. In 1927, David Hilbert exemplified this attitude when he objected that Brouwer’s restrictions on allowable mathematics–such as rejecting proof by contradiction–were like taking the telescope away from the astronomer.

But thanks in large part to the later development of constructive mathematics by Errett Bishop and Douglas Bridges in the second half of the 20th century, most contemporary philosophers of mathematics believe the question of whether constructivism could be successful in the sense of producing an adequate theory of the continuum is still open [see Wolf (2005) p. 346, and McCarty (2005) p. 382], and to that extent so is the question of whether the Standard Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes needs to be rejected or perhaps revised to embrace constructivism. Frank Arntzenius (2000), Michael Dummett (2000), and Solomon Feferman (1998) have done important philosophical work to promote the constructivist tradition. Nevertheless, the vast majority of today’s practicing mathematicians routinely use nonconstructive mathematics.

e. Nonstandard Analysis

Although Zeno and Aristotle had the concept of small, they did not have the concept of infinitesimally small, which is the informal concept that was used by Leibniz (and Newton) in the development of calculus. In the 19th century, infinitesimals were eliminated from the standard development of calculus due to the work of Cauchy and Weierstrass on defining a derivative in terms of limits using the epsilon-delta method. But in 1881, C. S. Peirce advocated restoring infinitesimals because of their intuitive appeal. Unfortunately, he was unable to work out the details, as were all mathematicians—until 1960 when Abraham Robinson produced his nonstandard analysis. At this point in time it was no longer reasonable to say that banishing infinitesimals from analysis was an intellectual advance. What Robinson did was to extend the standard real numbers to include infinitesimals, using this definition: h is infinitesimal if and only if its absolute value is less than 1/n, for every positive standard number n. Robinson went on to create a nonstandard model of analysis using hyperreal numbers. The class of hyperreal numbers contains counterparts of the reals, but in addition it contains any number that is the sum, or difference, of both a standard real number and an infinitesimal number, such as 3 + h and 3 – 4h2. The reciprocal of an infinitesimal is an infinite hyperreal number. These hyperreals obey the usual rules of real numbers except for the Archimedean axiom. Infinitesimal distances between distinct points are allowed, unlike with standard real analysis. The derivative is defined in terms of the ratio of infinitesimals, in the style of Leibniz, rather than in terms of a limit as in standard real analysis in the style of Weierstrass.

Nonstandard analysis is called “nonstandard” because it was inspired by Thoralf Skolem’s demonstration in 1933 of the existence of models of first-order arithmetic that are not isomorphic to the standard model of arithmetic. What makes them nonstandard is especially that they contain infinitely large (hyper)integers. For nonstandard calculus one needs nonstandard models of real analysis rather than just of arithmetic. An important feature demonstrating the usefulness of nonstandard analysis is that it achieves essentially the same theorems as those in classical calculus. The treatment of Zeno’s paradoxes is interesting from this perspective. See McLaughlin (1994) for how Zeno’s paradoxes may be treated using infinitesimals. McLaughlin believes this approach to the paradoxes is the only successful one, but commentators generally do not agree with that conclusion, and consider it merely to be an alternative solution. See Dainton (2010) pp. 306-9 for some discussion of this.

f. Smooth Infinitesimal Analysis

Abraham Robinson in the 1960s resurrected the infinitesimal as an infinitesimal number, but F. W. Lawvere in the 1970s resurrected the infinitesimal as an infinitesimal magnitude. His work is called “smooth infinitesimal analysis” and is part of “synthetic differential geometry.” In smooth infinitesimal analysis, a curved line is composed of infinitesimal tangent vectors. One significant difference from a nonstandard analysis, such as Robinson’s above, is that all smooth curves are straight over infinitesimal distances, whereas Robinson’s can curve over infinitesimal distances. In smooth infinitesimal analysis, Zeno’s arrow does not have time to change its speed during an infinitesimal interval. Smooth infinitesimal analysis retains the intuition that a continuum should be smoother than the continuum of the Standard Solution. Unlike both standard analysis and nonstandard analysis whose real number systems are set-theoretical entities and are based on classical logic, the real number system of smooth infinitesimal analysis is not a set-theoretic entity but rather an object in a topos of category theory, and its logic is intuitionist. (Harrison, 1996, p. 283) Like Robinson’s nonstandard analysis, Lawvere’s smooth infinitesimal analysis may also be a promising approach to a foundation for real analysis and thus to solving Zeno’s paradoxes, but there is no consensus that Zeno’s Paradoxes need to be solved this way. For more discussion see note 11 in Dainton (2010) pp. 420-1.

6. The Legacy and Current Significance of the Paradoxes

What influence has Zeno had? He had none in the East, but in the West there has been continued influence and interest up to today.

Let’s begin with his influence on the ancient Greeks. Before Zeno, philosophers expressed their philosophy in poetry, and he was the first philosopher to use prose arguments. This new method of presentation was destined to shape almost all later philosophy, mathematics, and science. Zeno drew new attention to the idea that the way the world appears to us is not how it is in reality. Zeno probably also influenced the Greek atomists to accept atoms. Aristotle was influenced by Zeno to use the distinction between actual and potential infinity as a way out of the paradoxes, and careful attention to this distinction has influenced mathematicians ever since. The proofs in Euclid’s Elements, for example, used only potentially infinite procedures. Awareness of Zeno’s paradoxes made Greek and all later Western intellectuals more aware that mistakes can be made when thinking about infinity, continuity, and the structure of space and time, and it made them wary of any claim that a continuous magnitude could be made of discrete parts. ”Zeno’s arguments, in some form, have afforded grounds for almost all theories of space and time and infinity which have been constructed from his time to our own,” said Bertrand Russell in the twentieth century.

There is controversy in the recent literature about whether Zeno developed any specific, new mathematical techniques. Some scholars claim Zeno influenced the mathematicians to use the indirect method of proof (reductio ad absurdum), but others disagree and say it may have been the other way around. Other scholars take the internalist position that the conscious use of the method of indirect argumentation arose in both mathematics and philosophy independently of each other. See Hintikka (1978) for a discussion of this controversy about origins. Everyone agrees the method was Greek and not Babylonian, as was the method of proving something by deducing it from explicitly stated assumptions. G. E. L. Owen (Owen 1958, p. 222) argued that Zeno influenced Aristotle’s concept of motion not existing at an instant, which implies there is no instant when a body begins to move, nor an instant when a body changes its speed. Consequently, says Owen, Aristotle’s conception is an obstacle to a Newton-style concept of acceleration, and this hindrance is “Zeno’s major influence on the mathematics of science.” Other commentators consider Owen’s remark to be slightly harsh regarding Zeno because, they ask, if Zeno had not been born, would Aristotle have been likely to develop any other concept of motion?

Zeno’s paradoxes have received some explicit attention from scholars throughout later centuries. Pierre Gassendi in the early 17th century mentioned Zeno’s paradoxes as the reason to claim that the world’s atoms must not be infinitely divisible. Pierre Bayle’s 1696 article on Zeno drew the skeptical conclusion that, for the reasons given by Zeno, the concept of space is contradictory. In the early 19th century, Hegel suggested that Zeno’s paradoxes supported his view that reality is inherently contradictory.

Zeno’s paradoxes caused mistrust in infinites, and this mistrust has influenced the contemporary movements of constructivism, finitism, and nonstandard analysis, all of which affect the treatment of Zeno’s paradoxes. Dialetheism, the acceptance of true contradictions via a paraconsistent formal logic, provides a newer, although unpop