Category Archives: Philosophical Traditions

Rationalism, Continental

Continental Rationalism

Continental rationalism is a retrospective category used to group together certain philosophers working in continental Europe in the 17th and 18th centuries, in particular, Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, especially as they can be regarded in contrast with representatives of “British empiricism,” most notably, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Whereas the British empiricists held that all knowledge has its origin in, and is limited by, experience, the Continental rationalists thought that knowledge has its foundation in the scrutiny and orderly deployment of ideas and principles proper to the mind itself. The rationalists did not spurn experience as is sometimes mistakenly alleged; they were thoroughly immersed in the rapid developments of the new science, and in some cases led those developments. They held, however, that experience alone, while useful in practical matters, provides an inadequate foundation for genuine knowledge.

The fact that “Continental rationalism” and “British empiricism” are retrospectively applied terms does not mean that the distinction that they signify is anachronistic. Leibniz’s New Essays on Human Understanding, for instance, outlines stark contrasts between his own way of thinking and that of Locke, which track many features of the rationalist/empiricist distinction as it tends to be applied in retrospect. There was no rationalist creed or manifesto to which Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, all subscribed (nor, for that matter, was there an empiricist one). Nevertheless, with due caution, it is possible to use the “Continental rationalism” category (and its empiricist counterpart) to highlight significant points of convergence in the philosophies of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, inter alia. These include: (1) a doctrine of innate ideas; (2) the application of mathematical method to philosophy; and (3) the use of a priori principles in the construction of substance-based metaphysical systems.

Table of Contents

  1. Origin and History of the Term "Rationalism"
  2. Innate Ideas
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
    4. Malebranche
  3. Mathematical Method
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
  4. A Priori Principles
    1. Intelligibility and the Cartesian Circle
    2. Substance Metaphysics
      1. Descartes
      2. Spinoza
      3. Leibniz
  5. Continental Rationalism, Experience, and Experiment
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Origin and History of the Term "Rationalism"

According to the Historisches Worterbuch der Philosophie, the word “rationaliste” appears in 16th century France, as early as 1539, in opposition to “empirique.” In his New Organon, first published in 1620 (in Latin), Francis Bacon juxtaposes rationalism and empiricism in memorable terms:

Those who have treated of the sciences have been either empiricists [Empirici] or dogmatists [Dogmatici]. Empiricists [Empirici], like ants, simply accumulate and use; Rationalists [Rationales], like spiders, spin webs from themselves; the way of the bee is in between: it takes material from the flowers of the garden and the field; but it has the ability to convert and digest them. (The New Organon, p. 79; Spedding, 1, 201)

Bacon’s association of rationalists with dogmatists in this passage foreshadows Kant’s use of the term “dogmatisch” in reference, especially, to the Wolffian brand of rationalist philosophy prevalent in 18th century Germany. Nevertheless, Bacon’s use of “rationales” does not refer to “Continental rationalism,” which developed only after the New Organon, but rather to the Scholastic philosophy that dominated the medieval period. Moreover, while Bacon is, in retrospect, often considered the father of modern empiricism, the above-quoted passage shows him no friendlier to the empirici than to the rationales. Thus, Bacon’s juxtaposition of rationalism and empiricism should not be confused with the distinction as it develops over the course of the 17th and 18th centuries, although his imagery is certainly suggestive.

The distinction appears in an influential form as the backdrop to Kant’s critical philosophy (which is often loosely understood as a kind of synthesis of certain aspects of Continental rationalism and British empiricism) at the end of the 18th century. However, it was not until the time of Hegel in the first half of the 19th century that the terms “rationalism” and “empiricism” were applied to separating the figures of the 17th and 18th centuries into contrasting epistemological camps in the fashion with which we are familiar today. In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, Hegel describes an opposition between “a priori thought,” on the one hand, according to which “the determinations which should be valid for thought should be taken from thought itself,” and, on the other hand, “the determination that we must begin and end and think, etc., from experience.” He describes this as the opposition between “Rationalismus and “Empirismus” (Werke 20, 121).

2. Innate Ideas

Perhaps the best recognized and most commonly made distinction between rationalists and empiricists concerns the question of the source of ideas. Whereas rationalists tend to think (with some exceptions discussed below) that some ideas, at least, such as the idea of God, are innate, empiricists hold that all ideas come from experience. Although the rationalists tend to be remembered for their positive doctrine concerning innate ideas, their assertions are matched by a rejection of the notion that all ideas can be accounted for on the basis of experience alone. In some Continental rationalists, especially in Spinoza, the negative doctrine is more apparent than the positive. The distinction is worth bearing in mind, in order to avoid the very false impression that the rationalists held to innate ideas because the empiricist alternative had not come along yet. (In general, the British empiricists came after the rationalists.) The Aristotelian doctrine, nihil in intellectu nisi prius in sensu (nothing in the intellect unless first in the senses), had been dominant for centuries, and it was in reaction against this that the rationalists revived in modified form the contrasting Platonic doctrine of innate ideas.

a. Descartes

Descartes distinguishes between three kinds of ideas: adventitious (adventitiae), factitious (factae), and innate (innatae). As an example of an adventitious idea, Descartes gives the common idea of the sun (yellow, bright, round) as it is perceived through the senses. As an example of a factitious idea, Descartes cites the idea of the sun constructed via astronomical reasoning (vast, gaseous body). According to Descartes, all ideas which represent “true, immutable, and eternal essences” are innate. Innate ideas, for Descartes, include the idea of God, the mind, and mathematical truths, such as the fact that it pertains to the nature of a triangle that its three angles equal two right angles.

By conceiving some ideas as innate, Descartes does not mean that children are born with fully actualized conceptions of, for example, triangles and their properties. This is a common misconception of the rationalist doctrine of innate ideas. Descartes strives to correct it in Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, where he compares the innateness of ideas in the mind to the tendency which some babies are born with to contract certain diseases: “it is not so much that the babies of such families suffer from these diseases in their mother’s womb, but simply that they are born with a certain ‘faculty’ or tendency to contract them” (CSM I, 304). In other words, innate ideas exist in the mind potentially, as tendencies; they are then actualized by means of active thought under certain circumstances, such as seeing a triangular figure.

At various points, Descartes defends his doctrine of innate ideas against philosophers (Hobbes, Gassendi, and Regius, inter alia) who hold that all ideas enter the mind through the senses, and that there are no ideas apart from images. Descartes is relatively consistent on his reasons for thinking that some ideas, at least, must be innate. His principal line of argument proceeds by showing that there are certain ideas, for example, the idea of a triangle, that cannot be either adventitious or factitious; since ideas are either adventitious, factitious, or innate, by process of elimination, such ideas must be innate.

Take Descartes’ favorite example of the idea of a triangle. The argument that the idea of a triangle cannot be adventitious proceeds roughly as follows. A triangle is composed of straight lines. However, straight lines never enter our mind via the senses, since when we examine straight lines under a magnifying lens, they turn out to be wavy or irregular in some way. Since we cannot derive the idea of straight lines from the senses, we cannot derive the idea of a true triangle, which is made up of straight lines, through the senses. Sometimes Descartes makes the point in slightly different terms by insisting that there is “no similarity” between the corporeal motions of the sense organs and the ideas formed in the mind on the occasion of those motions (CSM I, 304; CSMK III, 187). One such dissimilarity, which is particularly striking, is the contrast between the particularity of all corporeal motions and the universality that pure ideas can attain when conjoined to form necessary truths. Descartes makes this point in clear terms to Regius:

I would like our author to tell me what the corporeal motion is that is capable of forming some common notion to the effect that ‘things which are equal to a third thing are equal to each other,’ or any other he cares to take. For all such motions are particular, whereas the common notions are universal and bear no affinity with, or relation to, the motions. (CSM I, 304-5)

Next, Descartes has to show that the idea of a triangle is not factitious. This is where the doctrine of “true and immutable natures” comes in. For Descartes, if, for example, the idea that the three angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles were his own invention, it would be mutable, like the idea of a gold mountain, which can be changed at whim into the idea of a silver mountain. Instead, when Descartes thinks about his idea of a triangle, he is able to discover eternal properties of it that are not mutable in this way; hence, they are not invented (CSMK III, 184).

Since, therefore, the triangle can be neither adventitious nor factitious, it must be innate; that is to say, the mind has an innate tendency or power to form this idea from its own purely intellectual resources when prompted to do so.

Descartes’ insistence that there is no similarity between the corporeal motions of our sense organs and the ideas formed in the mind on the occasion of those motions raises a difficulty for understanding how any ideas could be adventitious. Since none of our ideas have any similarity to the corporeal motions of the sense organs – even the idea of motion itself – it seems that no ideas can in fact have their origin in a source external to the mind. The reason that we have an idea of heat in the presence of fire, for instance, is not, then, because the idea is somehow transmitted by the fire. Rather, Descartes thinks that God designed us in such a way that we form the idea of heat on the occasion of certain corporeal motions in our sense organs (and we form other sensory ideas on the occasion of other corporeal motions). Thus, there is a sense in which, for Descartes, all ideas are innate, and his tripartite division between kinds of ideas becomes difficult to maintain.

b. Spinoza

Per his so-called doctrine of “parallelism,” Spinoza conceives the mind and the body as one and the same thing, conceived under different attributes (to wit, thought and extension). (See Benedict de Spinoza: Metaphysics.) As a result, Spinoza denies that there is any causal interaction between mind and body, and so Spinoza denies that any ideas are caused by bodily change. Just as bodies can be affected only by other bodies, so ideas can be affected only by other ideas. This does not mean, however, that all ideas are innate for Spinoza, as they very clearly are for Leibniz (see below). Just as the body can be conceived to be affected by external objects conceived under the attribute of extension (that is, as bodies), so the mind can (as it were, in parallel) be conceived to be affected by the same objects conceived under the attribute of thought (that is, as ideas). Ideas gained in this way, from encounters with external objects (conceived as ideas) constitutes knowledge of the first kind, or “imagination,” for Spinoza, and all such ideas are “inadequate,” or in other words, confused and lacking order for the intellect. “Adequate ideas,” on the other hand, which can be formed via Spinoza’s second and third kinds of knowledge (reason and intuitive knowledge, respectively), and which are clear and distinct and have order for the intellect, are not gained through chance encounters with external objects; rather, adequate ideas can be explained in terms of resources intrinsic to the mind. (For more on Spinoza’s three kinds of knowledge and the distinction between adequate and inadequate ideas, see Benedict de Spinoza: Epistemology.)

The mind, for Spinoza, just by virtue of having ideas, which is its essence, has ideas of what Spinoza calls “common notions,” or in other words, those things which are “equally in the part and in the whole.” Examples of common notions include motion and rest, extension, and indeed God. Take extension for example. To think of any body – however small or however large – is to have a perfectly complete idea of extension. So, insofar as the mind has any idea of body (and, for Spinoza, the human mind is the idea of the human body, and so always has ideas of body), it has a perfectly adequate idea of extension. The same can be said for motion and rest. The same can also be said for God, except that God is not equally in the part and in the whole of extension only, but of all things. Spinoza treats these common notions as principles of reasoning. Anything that can be deduced on their basis is also adequate.

It is not clear if Spinoza’s common notions should be considered innate ideas. Spinoza speaks of active and passive ideas, and adequate and inadequate ideas. He associates the former with the intellect and the latter with the imagination, but “innate idea” is not an explicit category in Spinoza’s theory of ideas as it is in Descartes’ and also Leibniz’s. Common notions are not “in” the mind independent of the mind’s relation with its object (the body); nevertheless, since it is the mind’s nature to be the idea of the body, it is part of the mind’s nature to have common notions. Commentators differ over the question of whether Spinoza had a positive doctrine of innate ideas; it is clear, however, that he denied that all ideas come about through encounters with external objects; moreover, he believed that those ideas which do come about through encounters with external objects are of an inferior epistemic value than those produced through the mind’s own intrinsic resources; this is enough to put him in the rationalist camp on the question of the origin of ideas.

c. Leibniz

Of the three great rationalists, Leibniz propounded the most thoroughgoing doctrine of innate ideas. For Leibniz, all ideas are strictly speaking innate. In a general and relatively straightforward sense, this viewpoint is a direct consequence of Leibniz’s conception of individual substance. According to Leibniz, “each substance is a world apart, independent of everything outside of itself except for God. Thus all our phenomena, that is to say, all the things that can ever happen to us, are only the results of our own being” (L, 312); or, in Leibniz’s famous phrase from the Monadology, “monads have no windows,” meaning there is no way for sensory data to enter monads from the outside. In this more general sense, then, to give an explanation for Leibniz’s doctrine of innate ideas would be to explain his conception of individual substance and the arguments and considerations which motivate it. (See Section 4, b, iii, below for a discussion of Leibniz’s conception of substance; see also Gottfried Leibniz: Metaphysics.) This would be to circumvent the issues and questions which are typically at the heart of the debate over the existence of innate ideas, which concern the extent to which certain kinds of perceptions, ideas, and propositions can be accounted for on the basis of experience. Although Leibniz’s more general reasons for embracing innate ideas stem from his unique brand of substance metaphysics, Leibniz does enter into the debate over innate ideas, as it were, addressing the more specific questions regarding the source of given kinds of ideas, most notably in his dialogic engagement with Locke’s philosophy, New Essays on Human Understanding.

Due to Leibniz’s conception of individual substance, nothing actually comes from a sensory experience, where a sensory experience is understood to involve direct concourse with things outside of the mind. However, Leibniz does have a means for distinguishing between sensations and purely intellectual thoughts within the framework of his substance metaphysics. For Leibniz, although each monad or individual substance “expresses” (or represents) the entire universe from its own unique point of view, it does so with a greater or lesser degree of clarity and distinctness. Bare monads, such as comprise minerals and vegetation, express the rest of the world only in the most confused fashion. Rational minds, by contrast, have a much greater proportion of clear and distinct perceptions, and so express more of the world clearly and distinctly than do bare monads. When an individual substance attains a more perfect expression of the world (in the sense that it attains a less confused expression of the world), it is said to act; when its expression becomes more confused, it is said to be acted upon. Using this distinction, Leibniz is able to reconcile the terms of his philosophy with everyday conceptions. Although, strictly speaking, no monad is acted upon by any other, nor acts upon any other directly, it is possible to speak this way, just as, Leibniz says, Copernicans can still speak of the motion of the sun for everyday purposes, while understanding that the sun does not in fact move. It is in this sense that Leibniz enters into the debate concerning the origin of our ideas.

Leibniz distinguishes between “ideas” (idées) and “thoughts” (pensées) (or, sometimes, “notions” (notions) or “concepts” (conceptus)). Ideas exist in the soul whether we actually perceive them or are aware of them or not. It is these “ideas” that Leibniz contends are innate. “Thoughts,” by contrast is Leibniz’s designation for ideas which we actually form or conceive at any given time. In this sense, “thoughts” can be formed on the basis of a sensory experience (with the above caveats regarding the meaning a sensory experience can have in Leibniz’s thought) or on the basis of an internal experience, or a reflection. Leibniz alternatively characterizes our “ideas” as “aptitudes,” “preformations,” and as “dispositions” to represent something when the occasion for thinking of it arises. On multiple occasions, Leibniz uses the metaphor of the veins present in marble to illustrate his understanding of innate ideas. Just as the veins dispose the sculptor to shape the marble in certain ways, so do our ideas dispose us to have certain thoughts on the occasion of certain experiences.

Leibniz rejects the view that the mind cannot have ideas without being aware that it has them. (See Gottfried Leibniz: Philosophy of Mind.) Much of the disagreement between Locke and Leibniz on the question of innate ideas turns on this point, since Locke (at least as Leibniz represents him in the New Essays) is not able to make any sense out of the notion that the mind can have ideas without being aware of them. Much of Leibniz’s defense of his innate ideas doctrine takes the form of replying to Locke’s charge that it is absurd to hold that the mind could think (that is, have ideas) without being aware of it.

Leibniz marshals several considerations in support of his view that the mind is not always aware of its ideas. The fact that we can store many more ideas in our understanding than we can be aware of at any given time is one. Leibniz also points to the phenomenology of attention; we do not attend to everything in our perceptual field at any given time; rather we focus on certain things at the expense of others. To convey a sense of what it might be like for the mind to have perceptions and ideas in a dreamless sleep, Leibniz asks the reader to imagine subtracting our attention from perceptual experience; since we can distinguish between what is attended to and what is not, subtracting attention does not eliminate perception altogether.

While such considerations suggest the possibility of innate ideas, they do not in and of themselves prove that innate ideas are necessary to explain the full scope of human cognition. The empiricist tends to think that if innate ideas are not necessary to explain cognition, then they should be abandoned as gratuitous metaphysical constructs. Leibniz does have arguments designed to show that innate ideas are needed for a full account of human cognition.

In the first place, Leibniz recalls favorably the famous scenario from Plato’s Meno where Socrates teaches a slave boy to grasp abstract mathematical truths merely by asking questions. The anecdote is supposed to indicate that mathematical truths can be generated by the mind alone, in the absence of particular sensory experiences, if only the mind is prompted to discover what it contains within itself. Concerning mathematics and geometry, Leibniz remarks: “one could construct these sciences in one’s study and even with one’s eyes closed, without learning from sight or even from touch any of the needed truths” (NE, 77). So, on these grounds, Leibniz contends that without innate ideas, we could not explain the sorts of cognitive capacities exhibited in the mathematical sciences.

A second argument concerns our capacity to grasp certain necessary or eternal truths. Leibniz says that necessary truths can be suggested, justified, and confirmed by experience, but that they can be proved only by the understanding alone (NE, 80). Leibniz does not explain this point further, but he seems to have in mind the point later made by both Hume and Kant (to different ends), that experience on its own can never account for the kind of certainty that we find in mathematical and metaphysical truths. For Leibniz, if it can be granted that we can be certain of propositions in mathematics and metaphysics – and Leibniz thinks this must be granted – recourse must be had to principles innate to the mind in order to explain our ability to be certain of such things.

d. Malebranche

It is worth noting briefly the position of Nicolas Malebranche on innate ideas, since Malebranche is often considered among the rationalists, yet he denied the doctrine of innate ideas. Malebranche’s reasons for rejecting innate ideas were anything but empiricist in nature, however. His leading objection stems from the infinity of ideas that the mind is able to form independently of the senses; as an example, Malebranche cites the infinite number of triangles of which the mind could in principle, albeit not in practice, form ideas. Unlike Descartes and Leibniz, who view innate ideas as tendencies or dispositions to form certain thoughts under certain circumstances, Malebranche understands them as fully formed entities that would have to exist somehow in the mind were they to exist there innately. Given this conception, Malebranche finds it unlikely that God would have created “so many things along with the mind of man” (The Search After Truth, p. 227). Since God already contains the ideas of all things within Himself, Malebranche thinks that it would be much more economical if God were simply to reveal to us the ideas of things that already exist in him rather than placing an infinity of ideas in each human mind. Malebranche’s tenet that “we see all things in God” thus follows upon the principle that God always acts in the simplest ways. Malebranche finds further support for this doctrine from the fact that it places human minds in a position of complete dependence on God. Thus, if Malebranche’s rejection of innate ideas distinguishes him from other rationalists, it does so not from an empiricist standpoint, but rather because of the extent to which his position on ideas is theologically motivated.

3. Mathematical Method

In one sense, what it means to be a rationalist is to model philosophy on mathematics, and, in particular, geometry. This means that the rationalist begins with definitions and intuitively self-evident axioms and proceeds thence to deduce a philosophical system of knowledge that is both certain and complete. This at least is the goal and (with some qualifications to be explored below) the claim. In no work of rationalist philosophy is this procedure more apparent than in Spinoza’s Ethics, laid out famously in the geometrical manner (more geometrico). Nevertheless, Descartes’ main works (and those of Leibniz as well), although not as overtly more geometrico as Spinoza’s Ethics, are also modelled after geometry, and it is Descartes’ celebrated methodological program that first introduces mathematics as a model for philosophy.

a. Descartes

Perhaps Descartes’ clearest and most well-known statement of mathematics’ role as paradigm appears in the Discourse on the Method:

Those long chains of very simple and easy reasonings, which geometers customarily use to arrive at their most difficult demonstrations, had given me occasion to suppose that all the things which can fall under human knowledge are interconnected in the same way. (CSM I, 120)

However, Descartes’ promotion of mathematics as a model for philosophy dates back to his early, unfinished work, Rules for the Direction of the Mind. It is in this work that Descartes first outlines his standards for certainty that have since come to be so closely associated with him and with the rationalist enterprise more generally.

In Rule 2, Descartes declares that henceforth only what is certain should be valued and counted as knowledge. This means the rejection of all merely probable reasoning, which Descartes associates with the philosophy of the Schools. Descartes admits that according to this criterion, only arithmetic and geometry thus far count as knowledge. But Descartes does not conclude that only in these disciplines is it possible to attain knowledge. According to Descartes, the reason that certainty has eluded philosophers has as much to do with the disdain that philosophers have for the simplest truths as it does with the subject matter. Admittedly, the objects of arithmetic and geometry are especially pure and simple, or, as Descartes will later say, “clear and distinct.” Nevertheless, certainty can be attained in philosophy as well, provided the right method is followed.

Descartes distinguishes between two ways of achieving knowledge: “through experience and through deduction […] [W]e must note that while our experiences of things are often deceptive, the deduction or pure inference of one thing from another can never be performed wrongly by an intellect which is in the least degree rational […]” (CSM I, 12). This is a clear statement of Descartes’ methodological rationalism. Building up knowledge through accumulated experience can only ever lead to the sort of probable knowledge that Descartes finds lacking. “Pure inference,” by contrast,” can never go astray, at least when it is conducted by right reason. Of course, the truth value of a deductive chain is only as good as the first truths, or axioms, whose truth the deductions preserve. It is for this reason that Descartes’ method relies on intuition as well as deduction. Intuition provides the first principles of a deductive system, for Descartes. Intuition differs from deduction insofar as it is not discursive. Intuition grasps its object in an immediate way. In its broadest outlines, Descartes’ method is just the use of intuition and deduction in the orderly attainment and preservation of certainty.

In subsequent Rules, Descartes goes on to elaborate a more specific methodological program, which involves reducing complicated matters step by step to simpler, intuitively graspable truths, and then using those simple truths as principles from which to deduce knowledge of more complicated matters. It is generally accepted by scholars that this more specific methodological program reappears in a more iconic form in the Discourse on the Method as the four rules for gaining knowledge outlined in Part 2. There is some doubt as to the extent to which this more specific methodological program actually plays any role in Descartes’ mature philosophy as it is expressed in the Meditations and Principles (see Garber 2001, chapter 2). There can be no doubt, however, that the broader methodological guidelines outlined above were a permanent feature of Descartes’ thought.

In response to a request to cast his Meditations in the geometrical style (that is, in the style of Euclid’s Elements), Descartes distinguishes between two aspects of the geometrical style: order and method, explaining:

The order consists simply in this. The items which are put forward first must be known entirely without the aid of what comes later; and the remaining items must be arranged in such a way that their demonstration depends solely on what has gone before. I did try to follow this order very carefully in my Meditations […] (CSM II, 110)

Elsewhere, Descartes contrasts this order, which he calls the “order of reasons,” with another order, which he associates with scholasticism, and which he calls the “order of subject-matter” (see CSMK III, 163). What Descartes understands as “geometrical order” or the “order of reasons” is just the procedure of starting with what is most simple, and proceeding in a step-wise, deliberate fashion to deduce consequences from there. Descartes’ order is governed by what can be clearly and distinctly intuited, and by what can be clearly and distinctly inferred from such self-evident intuitions (rather than by a concern for organizing the discussion into neat topical categories per the order of subject-matter)

As for method, Descartes distinguishes between analysis and synthesis. For Descartes, analysis and synthesis represent different methods of demonstrating a conclusion or set of conclusions. Analysis exhibits the path by which the conclusion comes to be grasped. As such, it can be thought of as the order of discovery or order of knowledge. Synthesis, by contrast, wherein conclusions are deduced from a series of definitions, postulates, and axioms, as in Euclid’s Elements, for instance, follows not the order in which things are discovered, but rather the order that things bear to one another in reality. As such, it can be thought of as the order of being. God, for example, is prior to the human mind in the order of being (since God created the human mind), and so in the synthetic mode of demonstration the existence of God is demonstrated before the existence of the human mind. However, knowledge of one’s own mind precedes knowledge of God, at least in Descartes’ philosophy, and so in the analytic mode of demonstration the cogito is demonstrated before the existence of God. Descartes’ preference is for analysis, because he thinks that it is superior in helping the reader to discover the things for herself, and so in bringing about the intellectual conversion which it is the Meditations’ goal to effectuate in the minds of its readers. According to Descartes, while synthesis, in laying out demonstrations systematically, is useful in preempting dissent, it is inferior in engaging the mind of the reader.

Two primary distinctions can be made in summarizing Descartes’ methodology: (1) the distinction between the order of reasons and the order of subject-matter; and (2) the analysis/synthesis distinction. With respect to the first distinction, the great Continental rationalists are united. All adhere to the order of reasons, as we have described it above, rather than the order of subject-matter. Even though the rationalists disagree about how exactly to interpret the content of the order of reasons, their common commitment to following an order of reasons is a hallmark of their rationalism. Although there are points of convergence with respect to the second, analysis/synthesis distinction, there are also clear points of divergence, and this distinction can be useful in highlighting the range of approaches the rationalists adopt to mathematical methodology.

b. Spinoza

Of the great Continental rationalists, Spinoza is the most closely associated with mathematical method due to the striking presentation of his magnum opus, the Ethics, (as well as his presentation of Descartes’ Principles), in geometrical fashion. The fact that Spinoza is the only major rationalist to present his main work more geometrico might create the impression that he is the only philosopher to employ mathematical method in constructing and elaborating his philosophical system. This impression is mistaken, since both Descartes and Leibniz also apply mathematical method to philosophy. Nevertheless, there are differences between Spinoza’s employment of mathematical method and that of Descartes (and Leibniz). The most striking, of course, is the form of Spinoza’s Ethics. Each part begins with a series of definitions, axioms, and postulates and proceeds thence to deduce propositions, the demonstrations of which refer back to the definitions, axioms, postulates and previously demonstrated propositions on which they depend. Of course, this is just the method of presenting findings that Descartes in the Second Replies dubbed “synthesis.” For Descartes, analysis and synthesis differ only in pedagogical respects: whereas analysis is better for helping the reader discover the truth for herself, synthesis is better in compelling agreement.

There is some evidence that Spinoza’s motivations for employing synthesis were in part pedagogical. In Lodewijk Meyer’s preface to Spinoza’s Principles of Cartesian Philosophy, Meyer uses Descartes’ Second Replies distinction between analysis and synthesis to explain the motivation for the work. Meyer criticizes Descartes’ followers for being too uncritical in their enthusiasm for Descartes’ thought, and attributes this in part to the relative opacity of Descartes’ analytic mode of presentation. Thus, for Meyer, the motivation for presenting Descartes’ Principles in the synthetic manner is to make the proofs more transparent, and thereby leave less excuse for blind acceptance of Descartes’ conclusions. It is not clear to what extent Meyer’s explanation of the mode of presentation of Spinoza’s Principles of Cartesian Philosophy applies to Spinoza’s Ethics. In the first place, although Spinoza approved the preface, he did not author it himself. Secondly, while such an explanation seems especially suited to a work in which Spinoza’s chief goal was to present another philosopher’s thought in a different form, there is no reason to assume that it applies to the presentation of Spinoza’s own philosophy. Scholars have differed on how to interpret the geometrical form of Spinoza’s Ethics. However, it is generally accepted that Spinoza’s use of synthesis does not merely represent a pedagogical preference. There is reason to think that Spinoza’s methodology differs from that of Descartes in a somewhat deeper way.

There is another version of the analysis/synthesis distinction besides Descartes’ that was also influential in the 17th century, that is, Hobbes’ version of the distinction. Although there is little direct evidence that Spinoza was influenced by Hobbes’ version of the distinction, some scholars have claimed a connection, and, in any case, it is useful to view Spinoza’s methodology in light of the Hobbesian alternative.

Synthesis and analysis are not modes of demonstrating findings that have already been made, for Hobbes, as they are for Descartes, but rather complementary means of generating findings; in particular, they are forms of causal reasoning. For Hobbes, analysis is reasoning from effects to causes; synthesis is reasoning in the other direction, from causes to effects. For example, by analysis, we infer that geometrical objects are constructed via the motions of points and lines and surfaces. Once motion has been established as the principle of geometry, it is then possible, via synthesis, to construct the possible effects of motion, and thereby, to make new discoveries in geometry. According to the Hobbesian schema, then, synthesis is not merely a mode of presenting truths, but a means of generating and discovering truths. (For Hobbes’ method, see The English Works of Thomas Hobbes of Malmesbury, vol. 1, ch. 6.) There is reason to think that synthesis had this kind of significance for Spinoza, as well – as a means of discovery, not merely presentation. Spinoza’s methodology, and, in particular, his theory of definitions, bear this out

Spinoza’s method begins with reflection on the nature of a “given true idea.” The “given true idea” serves as a standard by which the mind learns the distinction between true and false ideas, and also between the intellect and the imagination, and how to direct itself properly in the discovery of true ideas. The correct formulation of definitions emerges as the most important factor in directing the mind properly in the discovery of true ideas. To illustrate his conception of a good definition, Spinoza contrasts two definitions of a circle. On one definition, a circle is a figure in which all the lines from the center to the circumference are equal. On another, a circle is the figure described by the rotation of a line around one of its ends, which is fixed. For Spinoza, the second definition is superior. Whereas the first definition gives only a property of the circle, the second provides the cause from which all of the properties can be deduced. Hence, what makes a definition a good definition, for Spinoza, is its capacity to serve as a basis for the discovery of truths about the thing. The circle, of course, is just an example. For Spinoza, the method is perfected when it arrives at a true idea of the first cause of all things, that is, God. Only the method is perfected with a true idea of God, however, not the philosophy. The philosophy itself begins with a true idea of God, since the philosophy consists in deducing the consequences from a true idea of God. With this in mind, the definition of God is of paramount importance. In correspondence, Spinoza compares contrasting definitions of God, explaining that he chose the one which expresses the efficient cause from which all of the properties of God can be deduced.

In this light, it becomes clear that the geometrical presentation of Spinoza’s philosophy is not merely a pedagogic preference. The definitions that appear at the outset of the five parts of the Ethics do not serve merely to make explicit what might otherwise have remained only implicit in Descartes’ analytic mode of presentation. Rather, key definitions, such as the definition of God, are principles that underwrite the development of the system. As a result, Hobbes’ conception of the analysis/synthesis distinction throws an important light on Spinoza’s procedure. There is a movement of analysis in arriving at the causal definition of God from the preliminary “given true idea.” Then there is a movement of synthesis in deducing consequences from that causal definition. Of course, Descartes’ analysis/synthesis distinction still applies, since, after all, Spinoza’s system is presented in the synthetic manner in the Ethics. But the geometrical style of presentation is not merely a pedagogical device in Spinoza’s case. It is also a clue to the nature of his system.

c. Leibniz

Leibniz is openly critical of Descartes’ distinction between analysis and synthesis, writing, “Those who think that the analytic presentation consists in revealing the origin of a discovery, the synthetic in keeping it concealed, are in error” (L, 233). This comment is aimed at Descartes’ formulation of the distinction in the Second Replies. Leibniz is explicit about his adherence to the viewpoint that seems to be implied by Spinoza’s methodology: synthesis is itself a means of discovering truth no less than analysis, not merely a mode of presentation. Leibniz’s understanding of analysis and synthesis is closer to the Hobbesian conception, which views analysis and synthesis as different directions of causal reasoning: from effects to causes (analysis) and from causes to effects (synthesis). Leibniz formulates the distinction in his own terms as follows:

Synthesis is achieved when we begin from principles and run through truths in good order, thus discovering certain progressions and setting up tables, or sometimes general formulas, in which the answers to emerging questions can later be discovered. Analysis goes back to the principles in order to solve the given problems only […] (L, 232)

Leibniz thus conceives synthesis and analysis in relation to principles.

Leibniz lays great stress on the importance of establishing the possibility of ideas, that is to say, establishing that ideas do not involve contradiction, and this applies a fortiori to first principles. For Leibniz, the Cartesian criterion of clear and distinct perception does not suffice for establishing the possibility of an idea. Leibniz is critical, in particular, of Descartes’ ontological argument on the grounds that Descartes neglects to demonstrate the possibility of the idea of a most perfect being on which the argument depends. It is possible to mistakenly assume that an idea is possible, when in reality it is contradictory. Leibniz gives the example of a wheel turning at the fastest possible rate. It might at first seem that this idea is legitimate, but if a spoke of the wheel were extended beyond the rim, the end of the spoke would move faster than a nail in the rim itself, revealing a contradiction in the original notion.

For Leibniz, there are two ways of establishing the possibility of an idea: by experience (a posteriori) and by reducing concepts via analysis down to a relation of identity (a priori). Leibniz credits mathematicians and geometers with pushing the practice of demonstrating what would otherwise normally be taken for granted the furthest. For example, in Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas, Leibniz writes, “That brilliant genius Pascal agrees entirely with these principles when he says, in his famous dissertation on the geometrical spirit […] that it is the task of the geometer to define all terms though ever so little obscure and to prove all truths though little doubtful” (L, 294). Leibniz credits his own doctrine of the possibility of ideas with clarifying exactly what it means for something to be beyond doubt and obscurity.

Leibniz describes the result of the reduction of concepts to identity variously as follows: when the thing is resolved into simple primitive notions understood in themselves (L, 231); “when every ingredient that enters into a distinct concept is itself known distinctly”; “when analysis is carried through to the end” (L, 292). Since, for Leibniz, all true ideas can be reduced to simple identities, it is, in principle, possible to derive all truths via a movement of synthesis from such simple identities in the way that mathematicians produce systems of knowledge on the basis of their basic definitions and axioms. This kind of a priori knowledge of the world is restricted to God, however. According to Leibniz, it is only possible for our finite minds to have this kind of knowledge – which Leibniz calls “intuitive” or “adequate” – in the case of things which do not depend on experience, or what Leibniz also calls “truths of reason,” which include abstract logical and metaphysical truths, and mathematical propositions. In the case of “truths of fact,” by contrast, with the exception of immediately graspable facts of experience, such as, “I think,” and “Various things are thought by me,” we are restricted to formulating hypotheses to explain the phenomena of sensory experience, and such knowledge of the world can, for us, only ever achieve the status of hypothesis, though our hypothetical knowledge can be continually improved and refined. (See Section 5, c, below for a discussion of hypotheses in Leibniz.)

Leibniz is in line with his rationalist predecessors in emphasizing the importance of proper order in philosophizing. Leibniz’s emphasis on establishing the possibility of ideas prior to using them in demonstrating propositions could be understood as a refinement of the geometrical order that Descartes established over against the order of subject-matter. Leibniz emphasizes order in another connection vis-à-vis Locke. As Leibniz makes clear in his New Essays, one of the clearest points of disagreement between him and Locke is on the question of innate ideas. In preliminary comments that Leibniz drew up upon first reading Locke’s Essay, and which he sent to Locke via Burnett, Leibniz makes the following point regarding philosophical order:

Concerning the question whether there are ideas and truths born with us, I do not find it absolutely necessary for the beginnings, nor for the practice of the art of thinking, to answer it; whether they all come to us from outside, or they come from within us, we will reason correctly provided that we keep in mind what I said above, and that we proceed with order and without prejudice. The question of the origin of our ideas and of our maxims is not preliminary in philosophy, and it is necessary to have made great progress in order to resolve it. (Philosophische Schriften, vol. 5, pp. 15-16)

Leibniz’s allusion to what he “said above” refers to remarks regarding the establishment of the possibility of ideas via experience and the principle of identity. This passage makes it clear that, from Leibniz’s point of view, the order in which Locke philosophizes is quite misguided, since Locke begins with a question that should only be addressed after “great progress” has already been made, particularly with respect to the criteria for distinguishing between true and false ideas, and for establishing legitimate philosophical principles. Empiricists generally put much less emphasis on the order of philosophizing, since they do not aim to reason from first principles grasped a priori.

4. A Priori Principles

A fundamental tenet of rationalism – perhaps the fundamental tenet – is that the world is intelligible. The intelligibility tenet means that everything that happens in the world happens in an orderly, lawful, rational manner, and that the mind, in principle, if not always in practice, is able to reproduce the interconnections of things in thought provided that it adheres to certain rules of right reasoning. The intelligibility of the world is sometimes couched in terms of a denial of brute facts, where a “brute fact” is something that “just is the case,” that is, something that obtains without any reason or explanation (even in principle). Many of the a priori principles associated with rationalism can be understood either as versions or implications of the principle of intelligibility. As such, the principle of intelligibility functions as a basic principle of rationalism. It appears under various guises in the great rationalist systems and is used to generate contrasting philosophical systems. Indeed, one of the chief criticisms of rationalism is the fact that its principles can consistently be used to generate contradictory conclusions and systems of thought. The clearest and best known statement of the intelligibility of the world is Leibniz’s principle of sufficient reason. Some scholars have recently emphasized this principle as the key to understanding rationalism (see Della Rocca 2008, chapter 1).

The intelligibility principle raises some classic philosophical problems. Chief among these is a problem of question-begging or circularity. The task of proving that the world is intelligible seems to have to rely on some of the very principles of reasoning in question. In the 17th century, discussion of this fundamental problem centered around the so-called “Cartesian circle.” The problem is still debated by scholars of 17th century thought today. The viability of the rationalist enterprise seems to depend, at least in part, on a satisfactory answer to this problem.

a. Intelligibility and the Cartesian Circle

The most important rational principle in Descartes’ philosophy, the principle which does a great deal of the work in generating its details, is the principle according to which whatever is clearly and distinctly perceived to be true is true. This principle means that if we can form any clear and distinct ideas, then we will be able to trust that they accurately represent their objects, and give us certain knowledge of reality. Descartes’ clear and distinct ideas doctrine is central to his conception of the world’s intelligibility, and indeed, it is central to the rationalists’ conception of the world’s intelligibility more broadly. Although Spinoza and Leibniz both work to refine understanding of what it is to have clear and distinct ideas, they both subscribe to the view that the mind, when directed properly, is able to accurately represent certain basic features of reality, such as the nature of substance.

For Descartes, it cannot be taken for granted from the outset that what we clearly and distinctly perceive to be true is in fact true. It is possible to entertain the doubt that an all-powerful deceiving being fashioned the mind so that it is deceived even in those things it perceives clearly and distinctly. Nevertheless, it is only possible to entertain this doubt when we are not having clear and distinct perceptions. When we are perceiving things clearly and distinctly, their truth is undeniable. Moreover, we can use our capacity for clear and distinct perceptions to demonstrate that the mind was not fashioned by an all-powerful deceiving being, but rather by an all-powerful benevolent being who would not fashion us so as to be deceived even when using our minds properly. Having proved the existence of an all-powerful benevolent being qua creator of our minds, we can no longer entertain any doubts regarding our clear and distinct ideas even when we are not presently engaged in clear and distinct perceptions.

Descartes’ legitimation of clear and distinct perception via his proof of a benevolent God raises notorious interpretive challenges. Scholars disagree about how to resolve the problem of the “Cartesian circle.” However, there is general consensus that Descartes’ procedure is not, in fact, guilty of vicious, logical circularity. In order for Descartes’ procedure to avoid circularity, it is generally agreed that in some sense clear and distinct ideas need already to be legitimate before the proof of God’s existence. It is only in another sense that God’s existence legitimates their truth. Scholars disagree on how exactly to understand those different senses, but they generally agree that there is some sense at least in which clear and distinct ideas are self-legitimating, or, otherwise, not in need of legitimation.

That some ideas provide a basic standard of truth is a fundamental tenet of rationalism, and undergirds all the other rationalist principles at work in the construction of rationalist systems of philosophy. For the rationalists, if it cannot be taken for granted in at least some sense from the outset that the mind is capable of discerning the difference between truth and falsehood, then one never gets beyond skepticism.

b. Substance Metaphysics

The Continental rationalists deploy the principle of intelligibility and subordinate rational principles derived from it in generating much of the content of their respective philosophical systems. In no aspect of their systems is the application of rational principles to the generation of philosophical content more evident and more clearly illustrative of contrasting interpretations of these principles than in that for which the Continental rationalists are arguably best known: substance metaphysics.

i. Descartes

Descartes deploys his clear and distinct ideas doctrine in justifying his most well-known metaphysical position: substance dualism. The first step in Descartes’ demonstration of mind-body dualism, or, in his terminology, of a “real” distinction (that is, a distinction between two substances) between mind and body is to show that while it is possible to doubt that one has a body, it is not possible to doubt that one is thinking. As Descartes makes clear in the Principles of Philosophy, one of the chief upshots of his famous cogito argument is the discovery of the distinction between a thinking thing and a corporeal thing. The impossibility of doubting one’s existence is not the impossibility of doubting that one is a human being with a body with arms and legs and a head. It is the impossibility of doubting, rather, that one doubts, perceives, dreams, imagines, understands, wills, denies, and other modalities that Descartes attributes to the thinking thing. It is possible to think of oneself as a thing that thinks, and to recognize that it is impossible to doubt that one thinks, while continuing to doubt that one has a body with arms and legs and a head. So, the cogito drives a preliminary wedge between mind and body.

At this stage of the argument, however, Descartes has simply established that it is possible to conceive of himself as a thinking thing without conceiving of himself as a corporeal thing. It remains possible that, in fact, the thinking thing is identical with a corporeal thing, in other words, that thought is somehow something a body can do; Descartes has yet to establish that the epistemological distinction between his knowledge of his mind and his knowledge of body that results from the hyperbolic doubt translates to a metaphysical or ontological distinction between mind and body. The move from the epistemological distinction to the ontological distinction proceeds via the doctrine of clear and distinct ideas. Having established that whatever he clearly and distinctly perceives is true, Descartes is in a position to affirm the real distinction between mind and body.

In this life, it is never possible to clearly and distinctly perceive a mind actually separate from a body, at least in the case of finite, created minds, because minds and bodies are intimately unified in the composite human being. So Descartes cannot base his proof for the real distinction of mind and body on the clear and distinct perception that mind and body are in fact independently existing things. Rather, Descartes’ argument is based on the joint claims that (1) it is possible to have a clear and distinct idea of thought apart from extension and vice versa; and (2) whatever we can clearly and distinctly understand is capable of being created by God exactly as we clearly and distinctly understand it. Thus, the fact that we can clearly and distinctly understand thought apart from extension and vice versa entails that thinking things and extended things are “really” distinct (in the sense that they are distinct substances separable by God).

The foregoing argument relies on certain background assumptions which it is now necessary to explain, in particular, Descartes’ conception of substance. In the Principles, Descartes defines substance as “a thing which exists in such a way as to depend on no other thing for its existence” (CSM I, 210). Properly speaking, only God can be understood to depend on no other thing, and so only God is a substance in the absolute sense. Nevertheless, Descartes allows that, in a relative sense, created things can count as substances too. A created thing is a substance if the only thing it relies upon for its existence is “the ordinary concurrence of God” (ibid.). Only mind and body qualify as substances in this secondary sense. Everything else is a modification or property of minds and bodies. A second point is that, for Descartes, we do not have a direct knowledge of substance; rather, we come to know substance by virtue of its attributes. Thought and extension are the attributes or properties in virtue of which we come to know thinking and corporeal substance, or “mind” and “body.” This point relies on the application of a key rational principle, to wit, nothingness has no properties. For Descartes, there cannot simply be the properties of thinking and extension without these properties having something in which to inhere. Thinking and extension are not just any properties; Descartes calls them “principal attributes” because they constitute the nature of their respective substances. Other, non-essential properties, cannot be understood without the principal attribute, but the principal attribute can be understood without any of the non-essential properties. For example, motion cannot be understood without extension, but extension can be understood without motion.

Descartes’ conception of mind and body as distinct substances includes some interesting corollaries which result from a characteristic application of rational principles and account for some characteristic doctrinal differences between Descartes and empiricist philosophers. One consequence of Descartes’ conception of the mind as a substance whose principal attribute is thought is that the mind must always be thinking. Since, for Descartes, thinking is something of which the thinker is necessarily aware, Descartes’ commitment to thought as an essential, and therefore, inseparable, property of the mind raises some awkward difficulties. Arnauld, for example, raises one such difficulty in his Objections to Descartes’ Meditations: presumably there is much going on in the mind of an infant in its mother’s womb of which the infant is not aware. In response to this objection, and also in response to another obvious problem, that is, that of dreamless sleep, Descartes insists on a distinction between being aware of or conscious of our thoughts at the time we are thinking them, and remembering them afterwards (CSMK III, 357). The infant is, in fact, aware of its thinking in the mother’s womb, but it is aware only of very confused sensory thoughts of pain and pleasure and heat (not, as Descartes points out, metaphysical matters (CSMK III, 189)) which it does not remember afterwards. Similarly, the mind is always thinking even in the most “dreamless sleep,” it is just that the mind often immediately forgets much of what it had been aware.

Descartes’ commitment to embracing the implications – however counter-intuitive – of his substance-attribute metaphysics, puts him at odds with, for instance, Locke, who mocks the Cartesian doctrine of the always-thinking soul in his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. For Locke, the question whether the soul is always thinking or not must be decided by experience and not, as Locke says, merely by “hypothesis” (An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Book II, Chapter 1). The evidence of dreamless sleep makes it obvious, for Locke, that the soul is not always thinking. Because Locke ties personal identity to memory, if the soul were to think while asleep without knowing it, the sleeping man and the waking man would be two different persons.

Descartes’ commitment to the always-thinking mind is a consequence of his commitment to a more basic rational principle. In establishing his conception of thinking substance, Descartes reasons from the attribute of thinking to the substance of thinking on the grounds that nothing has no properties. In this case, he reasons in the other direction, from the substance of thinking, that is, the mind, to the property of thinking on the converse grounds that something must have properties, and the properties it must have are the properties that make it what it is; in the case of the mind, that property is thought. (Leibniz found a way to maintain the integrity of the rational principle without contradicting experience: admit that thinking need not be conscious. This way the mind can still think in a dreamless sleep, and so avoid being without any properties, without any problem about the recollection of awareness.)

Another consequence of Descartes’ substance metaphysics concerns corporeal substance. For Descartes, we do not know corporeal substance directly, but rather through a grasp of its principal attribute, extension. Extension qua property requires a substance in which to inhere because of the rational principle, nothing has no properties. This rational principle leads to another characteristic Cartesian position regarding the material world: the denial of a vacuum. Descartes denies that space can be empty or void. Space has the property of being extended in length, breadth, and depth, and such properties require a substance in which to inhere. Thus, nothing, that is, a void or vacuum, is not able to have such properties because of the rational principle, nothing has no properties. This means that all space is filled with substance, even if it is imperceptible. Once again, Descartes answers a debated philosophical question on the basis of a rational principle.

ii. Spinoza

If Descartes is known for his dualism, Spinoza, of course, is known for monism – the doctrine that there is only one substance. Spinoza’s argument for substance monism (laid out in the first fifteen propositions of the Ethics) has no essential basis in sensory experience; it proceeds through rational argumentation and the deployment of rational principles; although Spinoza provides one a posteriori argument for God’s existence, he makes clear that he presents it only because it is easier to grasp than the a priori arguments, and not because it is in any way necessary.

The crucial step in the argument for substance monism comes in Ethics 1p5: “In Nature there cannot be two or more substances of the same nature or attribute.” It is at this proposition that Descartes (and Leibniz, and many others) would part ways with Spinoza. The most striking and controversial implication of this proposition, at least from a Cartesian perspective, is that human minds cannot qualify as substances, since human minds all share the same nature or attribute, that is, thought. In Spinoza’s philosophy, human minds are actually themselves properties – Spinoza calls them “modes” – of a more basic, infinite substance.

The argument for 1p5 works as follows. If there were two or more distinct substances, there would have to be some way to distinguish between them. There are two possible distinctions to be made: either by a difference in their affections or by a difference in their attributes. For Spinoza, a substance is something which exists in itself and can be conceived through itself; an attribute is “what the intellect perceives of a substance, as constituting its essence” (Ethics 1d4). Spinoza’s conception of attributes is a matter of longstanding scholarly debate, but for present purposes, we can think of it along Cartesian lines. For Descartes, substance is always grasped through a principal property, which is the nature or essence of the substance. Spinoza agrees that an attribute is that through which the mind conceives the nature or essence of substance. With this in mind, if a distinction between two substances were to be made on the basis of a difference in attributes, then there would not be two substances of the same attribute as the proposition indicates. This means that if there were two substances of the same attribute, it would be necessary to distinguish between them on the basis of a difference in modes or affections.

Spinoza conceives of an affection or mode as something which exists in another and needs to be conceived through another. Given this conception of affections, it is impossible, for Spinoza, to distinguish between two substances on the basis of a difference in affections. Doing so would be somewhat akin to affirming that there are two apples on the basis of a difference between two colors, when one apple can quite possibly have a red part and a green part. As color differences do not per se determine differences between apples, in a similar way, modal differences cannot determine a difference between substances – you could just be dealing with one substance bearing multiple different affections. It is notable that in 1p5, Spinoza uses virtually the same substance-attribute schema as Descartes to deny a fundamental feature of Descartes’ system.

Having established 1p5, the next major step in Spinoza’s argument for substance monism is to establish the necessary existence and infinity of substance. For Spinoza, if things have nothing in common with each other, one cannot be the cause of the other. This thesis depends upon assumptions that lie at the heart of Spinoza’s rationalism. Something that has nothing in common with another thing cannot be the cause of the other thing because things that have nothing in common with one another cannot be understood through one another (Ethics 1a5). But, for Spinoza, effects should be able to be understood through causes. Indeed, what it is to understand something, for Spinoza, is to understand its cause. The order of knowledge, provided that the knowledge is genuine, or, as Spinoza says, “adequate,” must map onto the order of being, and vice versa. Thus, Spinoza’s claim that if things have nothing in common with one another, one cannot be the cause of the other, is an expression of Spinoza’s fundamental, rationalist commitment to the intelligibility of the world. Given this assumption, and given the fact that no two substances have anything in common with one another, since no two substances share the same nature or attribute, it follows that if a substance is to exist, it must exist as causa sui (self-caused); in other words, it must pertain to the essence of substance to exist. Moreover, Spinoza thinks that since there is nothing that has anything in common with a given substance, there is therefore nothing to limit the nature of a given substance, and so every substance will necessarily be infinite. This assertion depends on another deep-seated assumption of Spinoza’s philosophy: nothing limits itself, but everything by virtue of its very nature affirms its own nature and existence as much as possible.

At this stage, Spinoza has argued that substances of a single attribute exist necessarily and are necessarily infinite. The last major stage of the argument for substance monism is the transition from multiple substances of a single attribute to only one substance of infinite attributes. Scholars have expressed varying degrees of satisfaction with the lucidity of this transition. It seems to work as follows. It is possible to attribute many attributes to one substance. The more reality or being each thing has, the more attributes belong to it. Therefore, an absolutely infinite being is a being that consists of infinite attributes. Spinoza calls an absolutely infinite being or substance consisting of infinite attributes “God.” Spinoza gives four distinct arguments for God’s existence in Ethics 1p11. The first is commonly interpreted as Spinoza’s version of an ontological argument. It refers back to 1p7 where Spinoza proved that it pertains to the essence of substance to exist. The second argument is relevant to present purposes, since it turns on Spinoza’s version of the principle of sufficient reason: “For each thing there must be assigned a cause, or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence” (Ethics 1p11dem). But there can be no reason for God’s nonexistence for the same reasons that all substances are necessarily infinite: there is nothing outside of God that is able to limit Him, and nothing limits itself. Once again, Spinoza’s argument rests upon his assumption that things by nature affirm their own existence. The third argument is a posteriori, and the fourth pivots like the second on the assumption that things by nature affirm their own existence.

Having proven that a being consisting of infinite attributes exists, Spinoza’s argument for substance monism is nearly complete. It remains only to point out that no substance besides God can exist, because if it did, it would have to share at least one of God’s infinite attributes, which, by 1p5, is impossible. Everything that exists, then, is either an attribute or an affection of God.

iii. Leibniz

Leibniz’s universe consists of an infinity of monads or simple substances, and God. For Leibniz, the universe must be composed of monads or simple substances. His justification for this claim is relatively straightforward. There must be simples, because there are compounds, and compounds are just collections of simples. To be simple, for Leibniz, means to be without parts, and thus to be indivisible. For Leibniz, the simples or monads are the “true atoms of nature” (L, 643). However, “material atoms are contrary to reason” (L, 456). Manifold a priori considerations lead Leibniz to reject material atoms. In the first place, the notion of a material atom is contradictory in Leibniz’s view. Matter is extended, and that which is extended is divisible into parts. The very notion of an atom, however, is the notion of something indivisible, lacking parts.

From a different perspective, Leibniz’s dynamical investigations provide another argument against material atoms. Absolute rigidity is included in the notion of a material atom, since any elasticity in the atom could only be accounted for on the basis of parts within the atom shifting their position with respect to each other, which is contrary to the notion of a partless atom. According to Leibniz’s analysis of impact, however, absolute rigidity is shown not to make sense. Consider the rebound of one atom as a result of its collision with another. If the atoms were absolutely rigid, the change in motion resulting from the collision would have to happen instantaneously, or, as Leibniz says, “through a leap or in a moment” (L, 446). The atom would change from initial motion to rest to rebounded motion without passing through any intermediary degrees of motion. Since the body must pass through all the intermediary degrees of motion in transitioning from one state of motion to another, it must not be absolutely rigid, but rather elastic; the analysis of the parts of the body must, in correlation with the degree of motion, proceed to infinity. Leibniz’s dynamical argument against material atoms turns on what he calls the law of continuity, an a priori principle according to which “no change occurs through a leap.”

The true unities, or true atoms of nature, therefore, cannot be material; they must be spiritual or metaphysical substances akin to souls. Since Leibniz’s spiritual substances, or monads, are absolutely simple, without parts, they admit neither of dissolution nor composition. Moreover, there can be no interaction between monads, monads cannot receive impressions or undergo alterations by means of being affected from the outside, since, in Leibniz’s famous phrase from the Monadology, monads “have no windows” (L, 643). Monads must, however, have qualities, otherwise there would be no way to explain the changes we see in things and the diversity of nature. Indeed, following from Leibniz’s principle of the identity of indiscernibles, no two monads can be exactly alike, since each monad stands in a unique relation to the rest, and, for Leibniz, each monad’s relation to the rest is a distinctive feature of its nature. The way in which, for Leibniz, monads can have qualities while remaining simple, or in other words, the only way there can be multitude in simplicity is if monads are characterized and distinguished by means of their perceptions. Leibniz’s universe, in summary, consists in monads, simple spiritual substances, characterized and distinguished from one another by a unique series of perceptions determined by each monad’s unique relationship vis-à-vis the others.

Of the great rationalists, Leibniz is the most explicit about the principles of reasoning that govern his thought. Leibniz singles out two, in particular, as the most fundamental rational principles of his philosophy: the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason. According to the principle of contradiction, whatever involves a contradiction is false. According to the principle of sufficient reason, there is no fact or true proposition “without there being a sufficient reason for its being so and not otherwise” (L, 646). Corresponding to these two principles of reasoning are two kinds of truths: truths of reasoning and truths of fact. For Leibniz, truths of reasoning are necessary, and their opposite is impossible. Truths of fact, by contrast, are contingent, and their opposite is possible. Truths of reasoning are by most commentators associated with the principle of contradiction because they can be reduced via analysis to a relation between two primitive ideas, whose identity is intuitively evident. Thus, it is possible to grasp why it is impossible for truths of reasoning to be otherwise. However, this kind of resolution is only possible in the case of abstract propositions, such as the propositions of mathematics (see Section 3, c, above). Contingent truths, or truths of fact, by contrast, such as “Caesar crossed the Rubicon,” to use the example Leibniz gives in the Discourse on Metaphysics, are infinitely complicated. Although, for Leibniz, every predicate is contained in its subject, to reduce the relationship between Caesar’s “notion” and his action of crossing the Rubicon would require an infinite analysis impossible for finite minds. “Caesar crossed the Rubicon” is a contingent proposition, because there is another possible world in which Caesar did not cross the Rubicon. To understand the reason for Caesar’s crossing, then, entails understanding why this world exists rather than any other possible world. It is for this reason that contingent truths are associated with the principle of sufficient reason. Although the opposite of truths of fact is possible, there is nevertheless a sufficient reason why the fact is so and not otherwise, even though this reason cannot be known by finite minds.

Truths of fact, then, need to be explained; there must be a sufficient reason for them. However, according to Leibniz, “a sufficient reason for existence cannot be found merely in any one individual thing or even in the whole aggregate and series of things” (L, 486). That is to say, the sufficient reason for any given contingent fact cannot be found within the world of which it is a part. The sufficient reason must explain why this world exists rather than another possible world, and this reason must lie outside the world itself. For Leibniz, the ultimate reason for things must be contained in a necessary substance that creates the world, that is, God. But if the existence of God is to ground the series of contingent facts that make up the world, there must be a sufficient reason why God created this world rather than any of the other infinite possible worlds contained in his understanding. As a perfect being, God would only have chosen to bring this world into existence rather than any other because it is the best of all possible worlds. God’s choice, therefore, is governed by the principle of fitness, or what Leibniz also calls the “principle of the best” (L, 647). The best world, according to Leibniz, is the one which maximizes perfection; and the most perfect world is the one which balances the greatest possible variety with the greatest possible order. God achieves maximal perfection in the world through what Leibniz calls “the pre-established harmony.” Although the world is made up of an infinity of monads with no direct interaction with one another, God harmonizes the perceptions of each monad with the perceptions of every other monad, such that each monad represents a unique perspective on the rest of the universe according to its position vis-à-vis the others.

According to Leibniz’s philosophy, in the case of all true propositions, the predicate is contained in the subject. This is often known as the “predicate-in-notion principle. The relationship between predicate and subject can only be reduced to an identity relation in the case of truths of reason, whereas in the case of truths of fact, the reduction requires an infinite analysis. Nevertheless, in both cases, it is possible in principle (which is to say, for an infinite intellect) to know everything that will ever happen to an individual substance, and even everything that will happen in the world of an individual substance on the basis of an examination of the individual substance’s notion, since each substance is an expression of the entire world. Leibniz’s predicate-in-notion principle therefore unifies both of his two great principles of reasoning – the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason – since the relation between predicate and subject is either such that it is impossible for it to be otherwise or such that there is a sufficient reason why it is as it is and not otherwise. Moreover, it represents a particularly robust expression of the principle of intelligibility at the very heart of Leibniz’s system. There is a reason why everything is as it is, whether that reason is subject to finite or only to infinite analysis.

(See also: 17th Century Theories of Substance.)

5. Continental Rationalism, Experience, and Experiment

Rationalism is often criticized for placing too much confidence in the ability of reason alone to know the world. The extent to which one finds this criticism justified depends largely on one’s view of reason. For Hume, for instance, knowledge of the world of “matters of fact” is gained exclusively through experience; reason is merely a faculty for comparing ideas gained through experience; it is thus parasitic upon experience, and has no claim whatsoever to grasp anything about the world itself, let alone any special claim. For Kant, reason is a mental faculty with an inherent tendency to transgress the bounds of possible experience in an effort to grasp the metaphysical foundations of the phenomenal realm. Since knowledge of the world is limited to objects of possible experience, for Kant, reason, with its delusions of grasping reality beyond those limits, must be subject to critique.

Sometimes rationalism is charged with neglecting or undervaluing experience, and with embarrassingly having no means of accounting for the tremendous success of the experimental sciences. While the criticism of the confidence placed in reason may be defensible given a certain conception of reason (which may or may not itself be ultimately defensible), the latter charge of neglecting experience is not; more often than not it is the product of a false caricature of rationalism

Descartes and Leibniz were the leading mathematicians of their day, and stood at the forefront of science. While Spinoza distinguished himself more as a political thinker, and as an interpreter of scripture (albeit a notorious one) than as a mathematician, Spinoza too performed experiments, kept abreast of the leading science of the day, and was renowned as an expert craftsman of lenses. Far from neglecting experience, the great rationalists had, in general, a sophisticated understanding of the role of experience and, indeed, of experiment, in the acquisition and development of knowledge. The fact that the rationalists held that experience and experiment cannot serve as foundations for knowledge, but must be fitted within, and interpreted in light of, a rational epistemic framework, should not be confused with a neglect of experience and experiment.

a. Descartes

One of the stated purposes of Descartes’ Meditations, and, in particular, the hyperbolic doubts with which it commences, is to reveal to the mind of the reader the limitations of its reliance on the senses, which Descartes regards as an inadequate foundation for knowledge. By leading the mind away from the senses, which often deceive, and which yield only confused ideas, Descartes prepares the reader to discover the clear and distinct perceptions of the pure intellect, which provide a proper foundation for genuine knowledge. Nevertheless, empirical observations and experimentation clearly had an important role to play in Descartes’ natural philosophy, as evidenced by his own private empirical and experimental research, especially in optics and anatomy, and by his explicit statements in several writings on the role and importance of observation and experiment.

In Part 6 of the Discourse on the Method, Descartes makes an open plea for assistance – both financial and otherwise – in making systematic empirical observations and conducting experiments. Also in Discourse Part 6, Descartes lays out his program for developing knowledge of nature. It begins with the discovery of “certain seeds of truth” implanted naturally in our souls (CSM I, 144). From them, Descartes seeks to derive the first principles and causes of everything. Descartes’ Meditations illustrates these first stages of the program. By “seeds of truth” Descartes has in mind certain intuitions, including the ideas of thinking, and extension, and, in particular, of God. On the basis of clearly and distinctly perceiving the distinction between what belongs properly to extension (figure, position, motion) and what does not (colors, sounds, smells, and so forth), Descartes discovers the principles of physics, including the laws of motion. From these principles, it is possible to deduce many particular ways in which the details of the world might be, only a small fraction of which represent the way the world actually is. It is as a result of the distance, as it were, between physical principles and laws of nature, on one hand, and the particular details of the world, on the other, that, for Descartes, observations and experiments become necessary.

Descartes is ambivalent about the relationship between physical principles and particulars, and about the role that observation and experiment play in mediating this relationship. On the one hand, Descartes expresses commitment to the ideal of a science deduced with certainty from intuitively grasped first principles. Because of the great variety of mutually incompatible consequences that can be derived from physical principles, observation and experiment are required even in the ideal deductive science to discriminate between actual consequences and merely possible ones. According to the ideal of deductive science, however, observation and experiment should be used only to facilitate the deduction of effects from first causes, and not as a basis for an inference to possible explanations of natural phenomena, as Descartes makes clear at one point his Principles of Philosophy (CSM I, 249). If the explanations were only possible, or hypothetical, the science could not lay claim to certainty per the deductive ideal, but merely to probability.

On the other hand, Descartes states explicitly at another point in the Principles of Philosophy that the explanations provided of such phenomena as the motion of celestial bodies and the nature of the earth’s elements should be regarded merely as hypotheses arrived at on the basis of a posteriori reasoning (CSM I, 255); while Descartes says that such hypotheses must agree with observation and facilitate predictions, they need not in fact reflect the actual causes of phenomena. Descartes appears to concede, albeit reluctantly, that when it comes to explaining particular phenomena, hypothetical explanations and moral certainty (that is, mere probability) are all that can be hoped for.

Scholars have offered a range of explanations for the inconsistency in Descartes’ writings on the question of the relation between first principles and particulars. It has been suggested that the inconsistency within the Principles of Philosophy reflects different stages of its composition (see Garber 1978). However the inconsistency might be explained, it is clear that Descartes did not take it for granted that the ideal of a deductive science of nature could be realized. Moreover, whether or not Descartes ultimately believed the ideal of deductive science was realizable, he was unambiguous on the importance of observation and experiment in bridging the distance between physical principles and particular phenomena. (For further discussion, see René Descartes: Scientific Method.)

b. Spinoza

The one work that Spinoza published under his own name in his lifetime was his geometrical reworking of Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy. In Spinoza’s presentation of the opening sections of Part 3 of Descartes’ Principles, Spinoza puts a strong emphasis on the hypothetical nature of the explanations of natural phenomena in Part 3. Given the hesitance and ambivalence with which Descartes concedes the hypothetical nature of his explanations in his Principles, Spinoza’s unequivocal insistence on hypotheses is striking. Elsewhere Spinoza endorses hypotheses more directly. In the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza describes forming the concept of a sphere by affirming the rotation of a semicircle in thought. He points out that this idea is a true idea of a sphere even if no sphere has ever been produced this way in nature (The Collected Works of Spinoza, Vol. 1, p. 32). Spinoza’s view of hypotheses relates to his conception of good definitions (see Section 3, b, above). If the cause through which one conceives something allows for the deduction of all possible effects, then the cause is an adequate one, and there is no need to fear a false hypothesis. Spinoza appears to differ from Descartes in thinking that the formation of hypotheses, if done properly, is consistent with deductive certainty, and not tantamount to mere probability or moral certainty.

Again in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza speaks in Baconian fashion of identifying “aids” that can assist in the use of the senses and in conducting orderly experiments. Unfortunately, Spinoza’s comments regarding “aids” are very unclear. This is perhaps explained by the fact that they appear in a work that Spinoza never finished. Nevertheless, it does seem clear that although Spinoza, like Descartes, emphasized the importance of discovering proper principles from which to deduce knowledge of everything else, he was no less aware than Descartes of the need to proceed via observation and experiment in descending from such principles to particulars. At the same time, given his analysis of the inadequacy of sensory images, the collection of empirical data must be governed by rules and rational guidelines the details of which it does not seem that Spinoza ever worked out.

A valuable perspective on Spinoza’s attitude toward experimentation is provided by Letter 6, which Spinoza wrote to Oldenburg with comments on Robert Boyle’s experimental research. Among other matters, at issue is Boyle’s “redintegration” (or reconstitution) of niter (potassium nitrate). By heating niter with a burning coal, Boyle separated the niter into a “fixed” part and a volatile part; he then proceeded to distill the volatile part, and recombine it with the fixed part, thereby redintegrating the niter. Boyle’s aim was to show that the nature of niter is not determined by a Scholastic “substantial form,” but rather by the composition of parts, whose secondary qualities (color, taste, smell, and so forth) are determined by primary qualities (size, position, motion, and so forth). While taking no issue with Boyle’s attempt to undermine the Scholastic analysis of physical natures, Spinoza criticized Boyle’s interpretation of the experiment, arguing that the fixed niter was merely an impurity left over, and that there was no difference between the niter and the volatile part other than a difference of state.

Two things stand out from Spinoza’s comments on Boyle. On the one hand, Spinoza exhibits a degree of impatience with Boyle’s experiments, charging some of them with superfluity on the grounds either that what they show is evident on the basis of reason alone, or that previous philosophers have already sufficiently demonstrated them experimentally. In addition, Spinoza’s own interpretation of Boyle’s experiment is primarily based in a rather speculative, Cartesian account of the mechanical constitution of niter (as Boyle himself points out in response to Spinoza). On the other hand, Spinoza appears eager to show his own fluency with experimental practice, describing no fewer than three different experiments of his own invention to support his interpretation of the redintegration. What Spinoza is critical of is not so much Boyle’s use of experiment per se as his relative neglect of relevant rational considerations. For instance, Spinoza at one point criticizes Boyle for trying to show that secondary qualities depend on primary qualities on experimental grounds. Spinoza thought the proposition needed to be demonstrated on rational grounds.  While Spinoza acknowledges the importance and necessity of observation and experiment, his emphasis and focus is on the rational framework needed for making sense of experimental findings, without which the results are confused and misleading.

c. Leibniz

In principle, Leibniz thinks it is not impossible to discover the interior constitution of bodies a priori on the basis of a knowledge of God and the “principle of the best” according to which He creates the world. Leibniz sometimes remarks that angels could explain to us the intelligible causes through which all things come about, but he seems conflicted over whether such understanding is actually possible for human beings. Leibniz seems to think that while the a priori pathway should be pursued in this life by the brightest minds in any case, its perfection will only be possible in the afterlife. The obstacle to an a priori conception of things is the complexity of sensible effects. In this life, then, knowledge of nature cannot be purely a priori, but depends on observation and experimentation in conjunction with reason

Apart from perception, we have clear and distinct ideas only of magnitude, figure, motion, and other such quantifiable attributes (primary qualities). The goal of all empirical research must be to resolve phenomena (including secondary qualities) into such distinctly perceived, quantifiable notions. For example, heat is explained in terms of some particular motion of air or some other fluid. Only in this way can the epistemic ideal be achieved of understanding how phenomena follow from their causes in the same way that we know how the hammer stroke after a period of time follows from the workings of a clock (L, 173). To this end, experiments must be carried out to indicate possible relationships between secondary qualities and primary qualities, and to provide a basis for the formulation of hypotheses to explain the phenomena.

Nevertheless, there is an inherent limitation to this procedure. Leibniz explains that if there were people who had no direct experience of heat, for instance, even if someone were to explain to them the precise mechanical cause of heat, they would still not be able to know the sensation of heat, because they would still not distinctly grasp the connection between bodily motion and perception (L, 285). Leibniz seems to think that human beings will never be able to bridge the explanatory gap between sensations and mechanical causes. There will always be an irreducibly confused aspect of sensible ideas, even if they can be associated with a high degree of sophistication with distinctly perceivable, quantifiable notions. However, this limitation does not mean, for Leibniz, that there is any futility in human efforts to understand the world scientifically. In the first place, experimental knowledge of the composition of things is tremendously useful in practice, even if the composition is not distinctly perceived in all its parts. As Leibniz points out, the architect who uses stones to erect a cathedral need not possess a distinct knowledge of the bits of earth interposed between the stones (L, 175). Secondly, even if our understanding of the causes of sensible effects must remain forever hypothetical, the hypotheses themselves can be more or less refined, and it is proper experimentation that assists in their refinement.

6. References and Further Reading

When citing the works of Descartes, the three volume English translation by Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, and Kenny was used. For the original language, the edition by Adam and Tannery was consulted.

When citing Spinoza’s Ethics, the translation by Curley in A Spinoza Reader was used. The following system of abbreviation was used when citing passages from the Ethics: the first number designates the part of the Ethics (1-5); then, “p” is for proposition, “d” for definition, “a” for axiom, “dem” for demonstration, “c” for corollary, and “s” for scholium. So, 1p17s refers to the scholium of the seventeenth proposition of the first part of the Ethics. For the original language, the edition by Gebhardt was consulted.

For the original language in Leibniz, the edition by Gerhardt was consulted.

a. Primary Sources

  • Bacon, Francis. The Works of Francis Bacon. 7 Volumes. Edited by J. Spedding, R. L. Ellis, and D.D. Heath. London: Longmans, 1857-70. Cited above as Spedding, volume, page.
  • Bacon, Francis. The New Organon. Edited by Lisa Jardine and Michael Silverthorne. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Descartes, René. Oeuvres de Descartes. 12 Volumes. Edited by C. Adam and P. Tannery. Paris: J. Vrin, 1964-76.
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. 3 vols. Vols. 1 and 2 translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch. Vol. 3 translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1984-91. Cited above as CSM or CSMK, volume, page.
  • Hegel, G.W.F. Werke in zwanzig BändenVorlesungen über die Geschichte der Philosophie: Werke XX. Edited by Eva Moldenhauer and Karl Markus Michel. Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1986. Cited as Werke, volume, page.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. The English Works of Thomas Hobbes of Malmesbury, Volume 1. London: John Bohn, 1839.
  • Leibniz, G.W. Philosophische Schriften. 7 Volumes. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin, 1875-90.
  • Leibniz, G.W. Philosophical Papers and Letters. Second Edition. Translated and edited by Leroy E. Loemker. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989. Cited above as L, page.
  • Leibniz, G.W. New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated and edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathan Bennett. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1996. Cited above as NE, page.
  • Locke, John. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 1979.
  • Malebranche, Nicholas. The Search after Truth. Translated and edited by Thomas M. Lennon and Paul J. Olscamp. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. Spinoza Opera. 4 Volumes. Edited by C. Gebhardt. Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol. 1. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1985.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. A Spinoza Reader: The Ethics and Other Works. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1994.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. Spinoza: Complete Works. Translated by Samuel Shirley and edited by Michael L. Morgan. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2002.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ayers, Michael (ed.). Rationalism, Platonism and God. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 2007.
  • Biasutti, Franco. “Reason and Experience in Leibniz and Spinoza” in Studia Spinozana, Volume 6, Spinoza and Leibniz (1990): 45-71.
  • Cottingham, John. The Rationalists. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 1988.
  • Della Rocca, Michael. Spinoza. London: Routledge, 2008.
  • Fraenkel, Carlos; Perinetti, Dario; Smith, Justin E.H. (eds.). The Rationalists: Between Tradition and Innovation. Dordrecht: Springer, 2011.
  • Gabbey, Alan. “Spinoza’s natural science and methodology” in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza, edited by Don Garrett. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Garber, Daniel. “Science and Certainty in Descartes” in Descartes: Critical and Interpretive Essays, edited by Michael Hooker. Baltimore, MD: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1978.
  • Garber, Daniel. Descartes Embodied: Reading Cartesian Philosophy through Cartesian Science. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Huenemann, Charlie. Understanding Rationalism. Durham, UK: Acumen Publishing, 2008.
  • Leduc, Christian. “Leibniz and Sensible Qualities” in British Journal for the History of Philosophy. 18(5), 2010: 797-819.
  • Nelson, Alan (ed.). A Companion to Rationalism. Oxford, UK: Blackwell, 2005.
  • Pereboom, Derk (ed.). The Rationalists: Critical Essays on Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz. Rowman & Littlefield, 1999.
  • Phemister, Pauline. The Rationalists: Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz. Polity, 2006.
  • Wilson, Margaret Dauler. Ideas and Mechanism: Essays on Early Modern Philosophy. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1999.


Author Information

Matthew Homan
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.

African Sage Philosophy

African Sage Philosophy

The Sage Philosophy Project began in the mid-1970s at the Department of Philosophy of the University of Nairobi Kenya. At the University, Henry Odera Oruka (1944-1995) popularized the term “Sage Philosophy Project,” and closely related terms such as “philosophic sagacity,” both by initiating a project of interviewing African sages, and by naming this project in a widely read popular article as the most promising of four trends of the relatively new field of African philosophy.

This encyclopedia article focuses primarily on Oruka and his immediate sources of inspiration, and then includes others whose projects share similar methodologies and goals.

Although the definition of the key terms is not always completely uniform, at the heart of this approach to African philosophy lies the emphasis on academically-trained philosophy students and professors interviewing non-academic wise persons whom Oruka called “sages,” and then engaging philosophically with the interview material. Oruka usually (but not always) emphasized keeping the identity of the individual sage well known.  He also insisted that it was the sage who knew the traditions of his or her ethnic group the best, and who would be able to have critical distance to evaluate and sometimes reject prevailing beliefs and practices. The goals of collecting the interviews and evaluating them have been articulated in Oruka’s many works. The first goal was to help construct texts of indigenous African philosophies. Before Oruka's project there was a dearth of existing texts and a need to record indigenous ideas, both for posterity (that is, for a sense of identity and for historical reasons) and for the present and future. African wisdom that had been marginalized by academia, and by city life, could provide valuable solutions to contemporaneous problems in Africa. Such texts of interviews could also sustain intellectual curiosity and provide practical guidance (or phronesis).

Oruka searched for sages and wanted a wider public to know not only their words (written down in transcripts) but also about their lives.  For him, a sage’s worth was not only in their ideas but also in the way they live: by embodying their philosophies, developing their character, and affecting their communities over the years. After all, the sages in Kenya operate in contexts of social conflict and exploitation. Sages are those from whom others seek moral and metaphysical advice and consultation on issues involving moral and psychological attitudes and judgments.Oruka looked to the term japaro in Luo, meaning “thinker,” to approximate the translation of sage. The term japaro is closely related to jang’ ad rieko which means “professional advisor.” He emphasized that people would single out sages for advice on even the most delicate matters.

Table of Contents

  1. Oruka Biography and Early Writings
  2. Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context
  3. Beginning Interviews in Kenya
  4. Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study
  5. Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages
  6. Criticisms of Sage Philosophy
  7. Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages
  8. Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years
  9. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students
  10. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Oruka Biography and Early Writings

The history of the project begins in the 1970s; nevertheless, it is important to understand the project's beginning in the context of its immediate precursors, both those that served as partial models and those that served as negative examples of what must not be done. It is also important to know something about Oruka’s academic training and background, and the skills and interests he brought to the project.

Oruka grew up surrounded by sages in his home area of Ugenya, in the Nyanza Province of Kenya, and as a youth he looked up to them and learned much wisdom from them. Graduating from St. Mary’s High School in Yala, he won a scholarship to study geography at Uppsala University in Sweden. While there, Oruka was influenced by philosophy Professor Ingemar Hedenius to follow his newly developing interests and study philosophy instead. Philosophy studies at Uppsala were divided into two tracks, Practical and Theoretical, and Oruka specialized in Practical Philosophy: Applied Ethics and Political Philosophy. The approach to philosophy Oruka learned both in Sweden and later at Wayne State University in Detroit, Michigan, was greatly influenced by the logical empiricists.  Indeed, Oruka referred to himself an empiricist as well (Practical 283). He would later remark that this narrow emphasis on analytic philosophy that he received in his formal training was an initial “handicap” to his ability to enter the debates on African philosophy upon his return to Kenya (Oruka, Trends 127).

When he returned to Kenya in 1970, Oruka became one of the first two African philosophy faculty members at University of Nairobi. At that time, many departments at the University of Nairobi (UON) were questioning the Eurocentric curriculum that was their colonial heritage. Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Okot p’Bitek, and Taban Lo Liyong were some of the scholars challenging the curriculum in literature, development studies, and other areas (Ogot). The Institute for African Studies at UON was founded in 1970.  Sage philosophy was an attempt to rise to the challenge of imagining an approach to philosophy that focused on African ideas and realities. The fields of literature and history had turned to oral sources; there was no reason that philosophy could not do the same.

When Oruka received his first full-time position in 1970, the field of African Philosophy was dominated by Placide Tempels, John Mbiti, and other early scholars who sometimes blurred the line between religious and philosophical thinking. Also, at that time, the Philosophy and Religious Studies departments at UON were merged. Having studied with Hedenius, famous for his arguments in favor of atheism, Oruka distinguished himself with early essays in 1972 and 1975 denouncing much of what was passing for “African philosophy” as no more than dressed-up mythical thinking. (He later judged these articles as “youthful” as well as “simplistic and unnecessarily offensive” Oruka, Trends 12, n.1; 125-29; Practical 285; Graness and Kresse 12). He championed a secular and logical approach to life’s big questions. However, also impressed by the need to appreciate an unfairly-marginalized, substantial body of thought coming from Africa, Oruka proposed his “sage philosophy” project as a way to provide missing information about African ideas and values. He was convinced that rural sages were not merely “religious figures” but thinkers who used their own rational powers to develop insights, and who could explain their reasoning to others.

In his early 1972 article "Mythologies as African Philosophy" Oruka was to insist on jettisoning traditions harmful to Africa’s present and future. He criticized both Placide Tempels' book Bantu Philosophy and John Mbiti's book African Religions and Philosophy as backward-looking champions of absolutely unphilosophical African traditions. He agreed with Fanon’s criticism of a certain type of misguided African intellectual who falsely builds up the greatness of African tradition in a futile attempt to convince Europeans that African culture is as good as theirs. Oruka wanted instead to write for an African audience (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 23).

In "Mythologies," Oruka began to articulate his emphasis on the need to acknowledge individual thinkers. By anonymizing everyone and providing only group consensus, Tempels, Mbiti, and W. E. Abraham (author of The Mind of Africa) presented “philosophy without philosophers.” He suggested, “We can as well start afresh by interviewing sage Africans and eliciting philosophical expositions from them” (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 30). While individuals’ thinking is influenced by their community and material conditions, they are not determined by them, and in fact individuals can also influence groups. Oruka also pointed out that a philosopher’s role is not just to describe how people think and act, but to make suggestions as to how they ought to think and act (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 31).

2. Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context

Oruka conceived of the project in relation to interjections from Kwasi Wiredu and Paulin Hountondji, whom he had met and who had both been invited to University of Nairobi. He had become familiar with their written works in early philosophy journals published in Africa, such as Second Order (University of Ife Press, Nigeria), Universitas (Accra), and Cahiers philosophiques africains/African philosophical journal (Zaire) (Oruka, Trends 129-30, 132-33). Both scholars had studied philosophy in African universities and abroad, Wiredu at University College, Oxford, and Hountondji at the École Normale Supérieure, and both were critical of the ethnophilosophical approaches of Tempels and Mbiti.

Wiredu, based in Ghana, emphasized the secular and rational nature of much ethical thought among the Akan groups in Ghana. He outlined three major hindrances to African cultural regeneration: anachronism, authoritarianism, and supernaturalism. But he also insisted that Africa had very wise and philosophical persons from whom a lot could be learned, especially if one paid attention to the nuances of concepts in African languages. In a 1972 issue of Second Order, Wiredu wrote that “it is a particular (though not exclusive) responsibility of African philosophers to research into their traditional background of philosophical thought” ("On an African Orientation" 12). However, he argued, while traditional concepts and codes of conduct should be an area of study, they should not lead to anachronism—an attempt to turn back the hands of time or cling to the days of yesteryear (7).

Wiredu was the first to label “what ‘our elders’ said” as “folk philosophies.” He found exciting the prospect of constructing, from “the living wise men of the tribe,” “the elaborate and argumentative reasons” behind the belief systems and moral guidelines of “our philosophers of old.”  Still, the resulting material could not, Wiredu believed, help to tackle most modern problems in Africa ("On an African Orientation" 5). Along with interest in past traditions, he maintained, scientific method and clear argumentation were necessary to guide African youths in confronting the new moral dilemmas facing contemporary African society. Barry Hallen, scrutinizing Wiredu’s article, says that Wiredu intended the phrase “folk philosophies” to refer to unreasoned beliefs whether they were African or Western (Hallen "Yoruba" 106-08). Wiredu followed up this exploration with an article that Oruka recommended to his readers, in which Wiredu compared and contrasted the meaning of “philosopher” and “wise man.” The material, first published in the article (Wiredu "What Is"), was later incorporated in Wiredu’s book (Wiredu Philosophy 139-173; see Oruka Trends 69n5).

Three years later (1975), in Second Order, Oruka explained that he and others at UON were already engaged in a project along the lines of Wiredu’s description. He said, “We are seeking to unsheathe, through constant contacts and discussions with those concerned, the elaborate philosophical views and reasons from the living traditional Kenyan thinkers and sages” (Oruka "The Fundamental" 54n6). He followed Wiredu’s words and ideas closely enough to repeat the descriptors “elaborate” and “reasons.” In his subsequent book he adopted the descriptors “folk philosophies” and “folk sage,” but clarified that, in addition to elders who are examples of folk sagacity, there were some philosophic sages able to scrutinize prevailing beliefs and give sustained arguments for their positions. The elders, he asserted, were more than just depositories of outdated folk wisdom. Philosophical sages were able both to describe the “culture philosophy” held by most members of their community and also to evaluate the content (or at least understand the genesis) of such culture philosophies.  In Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) Wiredu affirmed that “The recording and critical study of the thought of individual indigenous thinkers is worthy of the most serious attention of contemporary African philosophers” (37). In Cultural Universals and Particulars (1996), Wiredu wrote that Oruka’s sage philosophy book was the first to give “substantial notice” to individual philosophical thinkers in Africa (116).

Paulin Hountondji was another key influence on the development of sage philosophy. Hountondji gave a talk, "Philosophy and Its Revolutions," at the National University of Zaire during “Special Philosophy Days" in June 1973, and a second time at University of Nairobi in November, 1973.  Invitations for these talks came from the Philosophical Association of Kenya, which Oruka had founded (African 71).A paper based on the talks was published in French in 1973 in Cahiers philosophiques africains/African Philosophical Journal and later incorporated into Hountondji's book, African Philosophy: Myth and Reality (71-108). Hountondji’s “Revolution” article, and chapter, which Oruka and other Kenyans heard in person in 1973, criticized Tempels’ book Bantu Philosophy but appreciated the works of two European anthropologists, Paul Radin and Marcel Griaule, suggesting that their approach was much more careful than Tempels'. In fact, Hountondji said, Tempels’ study was “behind the anthropology of the time” (African 76). Twenty years earlier than Tempels, Radin wrote Primitive Man as Philosopher, a study of philosophy in Africa that focused on original thinkers who were members of an intellectual class in their communities. Hountoundji explained that Radin denounced the prejudice that African individuals are submerged in unitary group-think and took it upon himself to transcribe faithfully what members of this intellectual class told him (African 76; “La Philosophie” 30-31).

Paul Radin was an anthropologist originally from Poland who had studied with Franz Boas at Columbia University. Radin recorded interviews with members of a Native American community from Nebraska called the Winnebago. He explained in his book the necessity of researchers presenting “statements made by the Winnebago” word-for-word to the public, rather than merely recounting others’ ideas in ways that mixed the researcher’s interpretation with the words and views of those interviewed (64). Researchers who thought they did readers a service, by weaving together narratives and accounts of multiple informants in a harmonizing way, actually hid the extent of disagreement and diversity of opinion in the community (xxxviii).. Since primary sources are so valuable, Radin advocated a method of careful direct questioning, a process which under the best circumstances “can become something analogous to a true philosophical dialogue” (xxxi). Radin first published his book in 1927 but came out with a second edition in 1957 which critiqued Placide Tempels’ approach as presumptive and wrong-headed insofar as Tempels presumed to describe Bantu philosophy on behalf of Bantu speaking people, instead of letting them speak for themselves.

Hountondji stated that “Radin’s work is still, to the best of my knowledge, the most lucid ethnological critique of the theoretical assumptions of ethnophilosophy” (African 79). He praised Radin for showing the level of variations in retellings of particular myths and the ways each narrator influenced the myth in their own way, thus demonstrating the “profound individualism” among African intellectuals. Though he faulted Radin for use of the insulting word “primitive,” Hountondji was struck by how, unlike other Western anthropologists, Radin conveyed Africa as a place with views as plural as those of Western societies (African 79). While Radin’s study predated Oruka’s coining of the term “sage philosophy,” certainly Radin’s project shared much in common (both in goals and method) with Oruka’s later project. While Radin’s own first-hand research was with the Winnebago tribe (now more accurately called the Ho-Chunk people) in North America, Radin’s book drew upon primary source narratives of philosophical thought from various communities around the world, including proverbs and poems from Africa.

John Dewey, who wrote the foreword to Radin’s book, thanked Radin for challenging certain common misconceptions of Africa, which tended to present Africans as accepting “automatic moral standards” based on custom, when in fact African communities respected freedom of expression and emphasized individual moral responsibility (Radin xix). The relationship and consistency between Radin’s approach and that of Oruka’s sage philosophy project was alluded to by Kai Kresse (27-28), Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage 244n27), and Godwin Azenabor (73).

While Oruka probably heard about Radin in Hountondji’s 1973 presentation in Nairobi, Oruka nowhere credited Radin as an inspiration for his own chosen methods. In fact, Oruka engaged in a lifelong castigation of anthropologists, condemning them along with missionaries like Tempels. Oruka presumed that all anthropologists anonymized and conglomerated their sources into one, and he asserted that no anthropologist had devised a method similar to his own. Another important distinction to highlight is that Radin made extensive use of proverbs, poems, and songs, which he considered primary sources even if the specific authors were unknown, and found profound philosophical thought in these sources. Many in the field of African philosophy have also argued for using these kinds of sources as philosophical sources, for example, Kwame Gyekye of Ghana (An Essay 8-19) and Claude Sumner, a Canadian who researched Ethiopian philosophy for many years, and Ethiopian philosopher Workineh Kelbessa (“Logic"; Indigenous chap. 11). Even Oruka’s philosophy colleague at UON, Gerald Wanjohi, engaged in extensive analysis of proverbs (Wanjohi Wisdom). Oruka did not consider the study of proverbs to be related to his project. He narrowly focused on interviews with living sages as his only source, despite the fact that other contemporaries of his argued that one could find clear expression of logical argument as well as insightful reflection in proverbs (Sumner 22-23, 391-403). In an article he wrote on Sumner, Oruka mentioned that Sumner spent much effort studying and publishing Oromo proverbs (Practical 156), and maintained that studying proverbs is a different method than ethnophilosophy, but he did not develop these ideas. In Sage Philosophy (1990 ed. 115-16; 1991 ed. 117), the sage Simiyu Chaungo discussed the use of proverbs, but it is the only time proverbs are mentioned in the book.

Along with Radin, Hountonji’s 1973 article also included Marcel Griaule as an example of anthropologists whose methods differed from Tempels' (31). Griaule interviewed Ogotemmeli, a Dogon elder in Mali, at length. Hountondji was disappointed that certain political factions inside and outside of Africa preferred Tempels’ style of massive, definitive synthesis of all Bantu views to capturing the plurality and disorderliness of individual thought by direct interview. In the preface to the second edition of his book, which included “Philosophy and Its Revolutions," Hountondji again reiterated his 1974 opinion of Griaule as an important trend-setter:

The French anthropologist had chosen to transcribe the words of one sage among many. He showed the possibility of a long term project which would consist of a systematic transcription of such speeches, at least as a starting point of a critical discussion—what my Kenyan colleague the late Odera Oruka would later call “philosophical sagacity”—rather than as reconstruction of implicit philosophy behind the habits and customs of the host society through a lot of non-verifiable hypotheses which always amount to over-interpreting the facts”(ix).

In 1996, Hountondji saw Griaule’s project as an earlier version of Oruka’s project. He reiterated his estimation of Griaule in his reflections, published in English as The Struggle for Meaning (2002). In this work he reflected on his views back in 1970, saying of Griaule’s work:  “Voluntarily assigning to himself the humble task of a secretary, custodian, transcriber of the worldview of a black sage, of one spiritual master among others, the French ethnologist gave the example of scientific patience and, in my eyes, did more useful work than the ethnophilosophers proper who were in a hurry to reach definitive conclusions on African philosophy in general” (99).

Oruka himself was not that impressed with Griaule and Ogotommeli. In his 1983 article in International Philosophical Quarterly, later included in Sage Philosophy, Oruka argued that Ogotemmeli was at best a “folk sage” and not a philosophical sage, because he did not transcend his group’s views. Therefore, Griaule was not engaged in sage philosophy, but only in “culture philosophy” (Oruka Sage, 1991 ed., 34, 47, 49-50).

Hountondji and Oruka both missed research published by other anthropologists in the 1960s that cast doubt on whether Griaule really followed his professed method of interviewing one person and transcribing what that person said. D. A. Masolo made a thorough review of the anthropological literature on Griaule, most but not all of it in French, in which the authors questioned whether the conversation was recorded verbatim on the series of days that Griaule recounted. They suspected Griaule of reconstructing the conversation (Masolo African 69, 77, 260). Jack Goody’s book review discussed the painstaking detail an interview must have in order to meet standards of even a “soft” science like anthropology. The words of the person interviewed should be clearly demarcated from those that are the author's commentary. Field notes should be identified as such and distinguished from the words of the on-site translator. Original language transcriptions should be available, and the difficulty of translating esoteric words should be discussed by the author. Griaule’s book did not meet these standards (Goody review). Kibujjo Kalumba, who considered Griaule’s book on Ogotommeli one of three possible sources of sage philosophy, complained that the book contained too much of Griaule’s re-wording of Ogotommeli’s ideas (274, 276).

While Oruka declared in 1972 his intent to interview wise elders, he had just the previous year been quite critical of another philosopher’s use of the interview method applied to the topic of Ethics. Tore Nordenstam, a Norwegian based in Khartoum, Sudan, had interviewed three of his students, and on the basis of the interviews, published a book called Sudanese Ethics. In his rather harshly critical review of the book, Oruka questioned how interviews could be helpful at all in the study of ethics.

Oruka himself changed from someone with antipathy toward Nordenstam’s project to a person who promoted a large project interviewing African sages. His own project tried to avoid all of the pitfalls he pointed out in Nordenstam’s project: he did not interview students; he tried to interview those without exposure to studies in European philosophy; he addressed gender issues in most of his interviews; and he asked his interviewees sensitive political questions, even at great risk to himself (as in his interviews with Oginga Odinga). He shared with Nordenstam the focus on ethical issues. Before leaving this section on early precursors and influences on sage philosophy, it is important to note that a Kenyan scholar wrote an article in 1959 that is considered by several African philosophy scholars to be a clear precedent to sage philosophy. Taaita Towett (d. 2007) is known these days mostly for his role in Kenyan education and politics. As Minister of Education, he was “Patron” of the Philosophical Association of Kenya (see Thought and Practice 1.2 [1974] inside back cover). Towett's 1959 article, translated into French as “Le Role d’un philosophie Africain,” “earlier expressed an identical argument” to Oruka’s, according to Ochieng’-Odhaimbo ("The Tripartite" 30n4). In the PhD thesis he wrote under Oruka’s supervision (later excerpted in Sage Philosophy) and in a 1983 journal article, Anthony Oseghare claimed that Towett’s 1959 article provided “evidence of the existence of critical philosophical reasoning in Africa” (Oseghare "Sagacity" 95; Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 237). D. A. Masolo noted that Towett, as Oruka did later, argued that literacy was not a prerequisite for philosophizing and that Socrates was an example of an oral philosopher. Towett and Oruka both contended that “there must have been African philosophers engaged in the formulation of culture philosophy” (Masolo African Philosophy 236).

3. Beginning Interviews in Kenya

In his published works, Oruka explained that he began his sage philosophy project along with his philosophy colleague Joseph Donders, a White Father from the Netherlands ("The Fundamental" 54n6; Sage 1991 ed., 17-18). Donders explained that the funds for the study were originally received from the UON’s Dean’s Committee ("Don't Fence" 11).

Oruka’s early publications describing his projects and his methods began in the mid-1970s.  At the time, Oruka made it clear that his project was a national one, and was to include wise sages from a wide variety of ethnic groups in Kenya. At this time, there was a lot of focus on building up Kenya’s national identity, and Oruka wanted his project to be a unifier for the country, where all Kenyans could take pride in a common heritage of wise philosophers. He also wanted Kenyans to evaluate and be able to justify their cultural practices (see Oruka "Philosophy"; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 116-117; Presbey “Attempts”). At the same time, Oruka focused on sages who could articulate reasons for their philosophical and ethical positions that did not rely on mere tradition or on religious authority. He also focused on the individual identities and arguments of the sages rather than melding the ideas of individuals into the “group think” of an ethnic group; to do the latter would have been to engage in the common error in African studies in philosophy.

As F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo has noted, the exact terminology for Oruka’s project has changed over time. In 1974, when Oruka first announced his project, he called it “Thoughts on Traditional Kenyan Sages.” He first coined the term “philosophic sagacity” in 1978, referring to individual critical and reflective sages engaging in thought in such a way that even European or analytic philosophers would have to admit that philosophers were present in Africa. He created and emphasized the approach as an alternative to ethnophilosophy, which he disparaged. Ochieng’-Odhiambo noted that as early as 1983, Oruka called those engaged in philosophic sagacity “sage philosophers.” He contrasted them to ordinary sages (later called “folk sages”) who, in 1983, were not considered philosophical because they lacked critical reflection and ability to create independent positions on topics. In 1984, in “Philosophy in English Speaking Africa,” Oruka used the term “sage philosophy.” At first, the two terms “philosophic sagacity” and “sage philosophy” were used interchangeably and no distinctions were drawn. But during this third stage of Oruka’s works (1984–1995), he used the term “philosophic sagacity” increasingly less, while he used “sage philosophy” increasingly more. Oruka then used the term “sage philosophy” retrospectively to refer to his pre-1984 works (Ochieng’-Odhaimbo, "The Evolution" 19, 24).

The term “philosophic sagacity” Ochieng’-Odhiambo says, was first presented in Oruka’s “Four Trends in African Philosophy” at a conference on Dr. William Amo in Accra, Ghana, in July,  1978 (Oruka Trends 21n1; also see Ochieng’-Odhaimbo "Philosophic Sagacity: Aims"). "Four Trends" was later revised and presented at the World Congress of Philosophy conference in Dusseldorf, Germany, in August, 1978 (Ochieng’-Odhiambo "The Evolution" 22, 30n6). However a Nigerian philosopher, M. Akin Makinde, commenting on Oruka’s popularization of the term, claimed to be the originator of the term in the context of African philosophy. Makinde said he used the term “philosophic sagacity” (with a different connotation than Oruka) earlier than Oruka in a conference paper he presented in June, 1978, at University of Ife (Makinde “Robin"; “Philosophy" 107). Makinde’s 1978 paper drew upon concepts in Bombastus Paracelsus’ essay Philosophia Sagax. Collins English Dictionary explains that “philosophic” is a term created in Middle English around 1350-1400 C.E. that meant “learned, pertaining to alchemy.” Makinde claimed that Oruka used the term and concept “wrongly” but admitted that Oruka’s usage became the more widespread (African 9, 122, 137). Many scholars in African philosophy do not pay attention to the term “philosophic” and refer to Oruka’s method as “philosophical sagacity” (for example see Hallen African 68-75; Imbo 25-26).

Oruka articulated his project and his methods in the context of growing debates on the topic of African philosophy. He spearheaded the founding of the Philosophical Association of Kenya and the creation of its journal, Thought and Practice, in 1974. In his famous “Four Trends” article, he divided African Philosophy into four diverse interests/trends with differing methodologies (ethno-, nationalist-ideological, and professional philosophies including his own, philosophic sagacity).  At these venues and in publications he explained how his own project was not just another example of the wrong-headed “ethnophilosophy” approach (criticized by Paulin Hountondji) but was instead an alternative to it.

In a 1988 article of Oruka’s first published in German and later included in English in Trends (50-69), Oruka described his sage philosophy project, listed eight sages (all men) who were part of his study, and gave a biography of each. Two of them, Paul Mbuya Akoko (d. 1981) and Oruka Rang'inya (d. 1979), would be included at greater length in his soon-to-be-released, book-length study of sage philosophy. The others mentioned in 1988 had only biographies and short excerpts of their interviews in the German-language article, which were repeated in two books.  These latter sages were Njeru wa Kanuenje, Nyaga wa Mauch, Arap Baliach, Muganda Okwako (d. 1979), Joash Walumoli, and Kasina Wa Ndoo (Trends 57-61, 66-67; Sage 1991 ed., 37-40).  Oruka explained that he and researcher Jesse N.K. Mugambi interviewed Njeru wa Kanyenje of Embu district together, in the Embu language (Trends 66, 132).

Oruka’s book Sage Philosophy was published first by Brill in 1990 and later in Nairobi in 1991. There are a few differences between the two publications, but most changes are minor editorial ones, with the major exception that chapter one of the Brill edition has an extra twelve pages telling the background of the study. The book has three parts. The first is Oruka’s introduction to his project. Here, Oruka gathered (with little revision) several of his articles on sage philosophy that had been published over the years. The second part includes interviews with sages, and the third part includes commentators and critics. Documentation of the sages as individuals, and the publication of their originally oral philosophical thoughts, are crucial to Oruka’s methodology; this stands in contrast to ethnophilosophy’s practice of summarizing what informants (often anonymous) say and searching for a common denominator. Also in the second part, a brief biographical sketch and photograph precedes each interview. Oruka insisted on identifying both folk and philosophic sages in the same manner. In this way, his project does not merely repeat the same ground covered by ethnophilosophy.

The book minimizes the editorial/interpretive role of the professional philosopher, in comparison to other anthropological approaches, by including direct excerpts from interviews of sages who were self-conscious of their role as cultural critics and were respected for the critical views they articulated. Interviews with sages covered topics related to philosophy of religion (such as the existence of God, life after death, and so forth), free will and determinism, and ethics. These topics were of central concern to Oruka, whose own academic background from Uppsala was in practical philosophy rather than theoretical philosophy. Oruka mentioned “Chaungo Barasa, Fred Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Sam Oluoch Imbo, Samuel Wanjohi Kimiti and Mwangi Samuel Chege” as his key research assistants in the project (Sage 1991 ed., xi).

Oruka closely followed this first book-length publication with a monograph focusing on the interviews of Jaramogi Oginga Odinga. He explained that for the 1982 interviews he was accompanied by E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo, a well-known Kenyan historian who focuses on oral history, and in 1992 Chaungo Barasa assisted him. Odera Oruka provided his own commentary on the interviews, which focused on Odinga’s love of truth, and how Odinga’s commitment to truth and love of the masses contrasted with Plato’s own position in the Republic regarding the myth of metals, sometimes called the “noble lie” (Oginga Odinga xi, 3-4, 12-13).

4. Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study

Barry Hallen and J. Olubi Sodipo engaged in a research project that involved interviewing wise men among the Yoruba in Nigeria. They began their project around the same time as Oruka, in 1973-74.  As Hallen and Sodipo explain, they started in 1973 with a non-credit student study group at the University of Lagos. During university breaks they asked students to “establish face-to-face fieldwork relationships with the elders and wise men of their family compounds, villages, and towns” (Hallen and Sodipo 9). They chose the concept of the person as the theme for these first discussions. After this first study, they interviewed people in the Ekiti region from 1974-84 and moved the project to the University of Ife (now Obafemi Awolowo University) in 1975 (Hallen and Sodipo xvi, 11). Sodipo became head of the newly independent philosophy department that separated from the religious studies department in 1975.

Hallen and Sodipo chose to study herbalists and native doctors because they were more critically sophisticated than the “ordinary persons” whom they advised, and were able to offer theoretical concepts (10-11).  They explained that the onisegun (Yoruba wise men) they interviewed were organized into their own professional society called an egbe, with rules, evaluations, possible reprimands, and a pledge of secrecy. The onisegun were not mere masters of medicine, but rather, they “[gave] advice and counsel about business dealings, family problems, unhappy personal situations, religious problems, and the future, as well as about physical and mental illness” (13).  They did not name their individual interlocutors because, as they explained, those they interviewed requested to remain anonymous (14). They acknowledged that the practical questions regarding interviewing methods were many, and they tried to sort out the question: “is each man to be treated as an individual, potentially eccentric thinker, or are opinions to be somehow collated and presented as shared and communal?" (8). They followed the latter plan, due to the fact that they were studying language use. Their study had philosophical insights regarding how the use of words “knowledge” and “belief” were understood, and came to note that among the Yoruba, the use of the term translated as “knowledge” is much narrower than the usage in Britain or the United States, because it was reserved for first-hand knowledge alone. In Britain or the U.S., people commonly claimed to know a vast amount of information (in the form of propositions) that went beyond their first-hand knowledge (see Hallen and Sodipo; Hallen "Yoruba").

Because it involved academic philosophers interviewing wise elders in Africa, many people associated the Hallen and Sodipo project with Oruka’s sage philosophy project. However, at least in some of his writings, Oruka clarified that he did not consider their work that of sage philosophy due to its lack of emphasis on individual sages. In fact, Oruka complained that it looked like the onisegun of the study held views “in consensus” and therefore to study their views was “anthropology, not philosophy” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-10; quote, 10), or even “culture philosophy,” “cultural prejudices” or “philosophication” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 50). “Philosophication” is a term that Oruka intended to have a derogatory tone. At one point he defined it as “the discovery of a philosophy out of no philosophy;” he also played with coining the word “philosofolkation” which involved loving the “folk” so much that one invented a philosophy for them and made oneself its spokesperson (1990b, 7). Oruka’s criticisms began as early as his 1975 article, when he charged J. O. Sodipo with trying to pass off African superstitions regarding the agency of the Yoruba gods as an African understanding of cause and, hence, philosophical (Oruka "The Fundamental" 48). In a more conciliatory tone, he wrote in his 1983 article that the Hallen-Sodipo project, like Griaule’s Ogotemmeli, while not “philosophic sagacity,” may be “some form of sagacity” (Oruka "Sagacity" 389; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 133).

On this point, Ochieng’-Odhiambo pointed out ("The Evolution" 27) that a particular end note in an article of Oruka’s 1990 book, Trends in Contemporary African Philosophy (Oruka Trends 68), suggested that Hallen and Sodipo’s project might be part of sage philosophy, despite Oruka’s clarification in other works (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-9, 50) that it was not. This endnote is a bit indirect. Oruka listed Hallen and Sodipo’s works along with several others that directly address sage philosophy, and then added the caveat, “It is not the case that every one of these writings addresses itself to the direct question of Sage philosophy. But they all make special reference to a type of thinking in Africa that can only owe its existence to the thoughts of some wise men (and women) in traditional Africa.” This statement makes it sound like Hallen and Sodipo were fellow travelers. Interestingly enough, Oruka mentioned that at a certain point in his research he interviewed some sages who wanted their names withheld (Sage 1991 ed., 65n4), and he mentioned specifically a parallel with Hallen and Sodipo’s study.

In his 2006 book, African Philosophy: The Analytic Approach, Hallen agreed that it was best to keep his own project and Oruka’s separate. As good grounds for separating them, Hallen explained that his and Sodipo’s project was always intended to be an exercise in philosophy of language, and he admitted that such was not the case with Oruka’s interviews. He also acknowledged that Oruka wanted to keep them separate (4–5). But he also explained, in Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft, that he thought that the kinds of description of their project that Oruka engaged in were unkind and unfair. Oruka did not take into account that when one does philosophy of language one cannot help but search for common usages of terms and concepts. Hallen recounted in an afterword to the 1997 edition of Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft the shock he experienced upon first reading criticisms of their work such as this. He and Sodipo had been bracing for criticisms from anthropologists; they expected to be told that they weren’t properly trained to do fieldwork. But they were surprised to find themselves criticized by philosophers for advocating a communal consensus account of African thought, basically being accused of the dreaded “ethnophilosophy” as Hountondji had described it.

Hallen asked Hountodji and Oruka to rethink their criticism, since there was no way to practice ordinary language philosophical analysis, whether in Africa, England, or elsewhere, without focusing on common meanings. Hallen thought that the fact that their study was able to debunk many prevailing myths and stereotypes about Africa, including misconceptions made popular by some anthropologists that considered African thought as pre-reflective, uncritical, traditional, emotional, and non-reasonable. This was evidence that they should be appreciated, not lumped in with anthropologists and ethnophilosophers whose projects were evaluated negatively (Hallen and Sodipo 136-37n16; 140). Indeed, one of the surprising conclusions of Hallen and Sodipo’s study was that the onisegun had such stringent criteria for counting something as knowledge (that is, restricting it to first-hand experience, and requiring careful reporting and testimony from all witnesses), that they made Euro-Americans who accept second-hand propositional knowledge as true seem “dangerously naïve or perhaps even ignorant” in comparison to the onisegun (Hallen Yoruba 299).

While discussing parallels in Nigeria, it is important to note that Campbell S. Momoh (d. 2006) engaged in interviews with elders of the Uchi community.  Momoh says he responded to Hallen’s call for philosophers to go to villages to discuss philosophical topics with illiterate elders (Momoh "African" 99). He cited as his intellectual sources for the methodology of the project not Oruka but instead both Paul Radin and William Abraham. In his 1962 book, Abraham distinguished public philosophy from private philosophy, referring to Griaule’s study of Ogotommeli as an example of “of an individual African philosopher rather than a repository of the public philosophy” (104). Momoh saw a commonality between Radin’s notion of the African intellectual and what Abraham called “private philosophy” (Momoh The Substance 53, 55). Momoh insisted that interviewees should be named and credited.

Momoh was himself involved in interviewing elder sages. He did his dissertation fieldwork in 1978 and submitted his dissertation in 1979 to Indiana University. His dissertation committee included William Abraham and Ivan Karp (An African Conception).  The dissertation includes lengthy sections naming elder interlocutors (such as Aliu Oshiothenaua, Saliu Ikharo and others), paraphrasing their conversation in detail as well as quoting them directly (92-120). Momoh also provides contextual background of the sages’ standing and purpose in their communities (see especially 45-48, 67-70, 85-87). He even mentions seeming interruptions in the discussion, such as the presence of a young boy or a chicken, and how the conversation is shaped by these interactions (something for the most part missing from the interviews in Oruka’s study). Topics focus on metaphysics and ethics. Along with accounts of the elders’ discussions, Momoh includes his interpretation and analysis of what the elders say. While the elders may convey their ideas in story and myths, these do not just reflect communal philosophies since some of the stories are creations of individual men (for example, Ikharo’s story of woman’s refusal to accept marrying man as her God-given duty and role, see 116-117).

In his published work, Momoh names some elders, quotes them verbatim, and gives specific examples of methodological challenges during his interview of them ("African Philosophy" 87-88).  He named Aliu Oshiothenaua, Pa Egbue, Pa Abudah (Momoh’s uncle), and a hunter named A. M. J. Momoh (The Substance 66, 245, 254-55, 376-78). He found in the interview of the hunter a “doctrine of existential gratitude” (The Substance 382). Oshiothenaua asserted a theory of human dependence on nature (The Substance 376). An ethnophilosophical study that merely explored communally held beliefs in the sense of Abraham’s “public philosophy” would be incomplete, Momoh insisted, because “alongside with it” it would need to name individual intellectuals and add additional contextual information such as the time period, cultural paradigm, and branch of philosophy relevant to the discussions. He criticized Bodunrin, who wanted to make an “absolute dichotomy” between ethnophilosophy and the sagacious elders, since, according to Momoh, the latter were based on the former–that is, the “sagacious elders” philosophized in a general context provided by public philosophy ("African" 77-78, 80-81; The Substance 56, 58, 59).

Momoh also insisted that sagacious elders had a better practice than much of contemporary analytic academic philosophy, since their goal was not the narrow one of negatively appraising received ideas, but the broader project of building holistic systems and attending to important moral issues ("African Philosophy" 91; The Substance 69, 75, 78). While Oruka notes that in Momoh’s earlier 1985 article Momoh seemed unaware of Oruka’s sage philosophy project (Oruka, Sage 1990 ed., xxiv) and castigated Oruka as a member of the “African logical neo-positivists” who denigrated ancient African philosophy (Momoh based this estimate on Oruka’s 1972 article critical of myth, see The Substance 64), he later revised his estimate of Oruka and acknowledged his sage philosophy project (The Substance x). In an article originally published in 1987 (included in Sage 1990 ed.), Oruka expressed his agreement with C. S. Momoh’s position that the names of sages interviewed must be given and their views credited to them (Sage 1990 ed., 20). Fayemi Ademola Kazeem considered Momoh to be engaging in a sage philosophy project as was Oruka, noting that Momoh preferred to call it “ancient African philosophy” (Kazeem 196).

Godwin Azenabor included Hallen and Sodipo, Momoh, Oruka and others in a common category of African philosophy which he called the “Purist school” because all were committed to the assertions that Africa has a similar practice of raising philosophical questions and answering them as does the West; however they all saw the need to break free of Western paradigms, conceptual schemes, and conditioning. All in the Purist School emphasized the relevance of African culture and tradition for both philosophy as well as models for African development (Azenabor Understanding xiv). While the choice of “Purist” as a descriptor can be questioned (see Sophie Oluwole’s defense of Oruka’s project as admitting up front the multiple influences on contemporary rural sages, in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 155), Azenabor’s categorization helps us to see the common themes and approaches of authors who emphasized their distinction from and competition with each other.

5. Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages

In some works Oruka was at pains to distinguish “folk sages” and “folk sagacity” (wise elders who could recount community traditions and beliefs but not take a critical, evaluative stance toward them) from “philosophical sages” or “philosophic sagacity” which were the interviews and ideas of particularly reflective and evaluative sages. The distinction copied “first order” and “second order” distinctions in philosophy to a great extent. Many philosophers concluded that the only important part of the sage philosophy project was the “philosophic sagacity” part. However, such an approach left unexplained the role that folk sages played in the project. Why continue to include folk sages if they are examples of unphilosophical individuals? Several scholars addressed this thorny topic (Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria"; Van Hook).

Omedi Ochieng noted the irony that while Oruka first began his project to debunk Western scoffers who thought Africans were involved in unreflective groupthink, his comments championing the philosophic sages as “geniuses” in contrast to folk sages and other Africans who were satisfied at following others and not thinking for themselves ended up reinforcing the negative stereotype of Africans (“Epistemology” 348-351). He thought that Oruka capitulated and accepted academic definitions of philosophy that belittled folk wisdom and championed abstraction in a way that silenced the important contributions of many Africans (“Ideology” 153-57). Oluwole likewise noted that in some of Oruka’s texts he seemed to define “philosophy” so narrowly that even his own sages would fail to meet such narrow criteria, which would ironically lead to the failure of his own project. She insists, however, that if the sage interviews could be approached by sensitive scholars familiar with the sages’ language and context, without the near-ubiquitous prejudice against finding philosophy in African oral practices, that the project in this sense is very promising (Oluwole in Graness and Kresse 158-61).

An additional problem is that even when Oruka sorted out his folk and philosophical sages, the folk sages still demonstrated the intellectual virtues Oruka insisted belonged only to the philosophical sages. To illustrate this point, let me highlight that each of the seven “folk sages” in Sage Philosophy (chap. 6) distinguished their views from those of their communities on at least one topic. Chege Kamau said that he didn’t believe the afterlife consists in ancestral spirits as others believe. Rather, he posited, all people rejoin one big soul, which he called God. Joseph Muthee advocated sometimes unpopular inter-tribal marriages as a means of building a national culture. Ali Mwitani Masero argued that death is the end of the human being. Zacharia Nyandere said he believed men and women were equal, despite Luo perceptions to the contrary. Abel M’Nkabui said all humans were equal, and that inequalities were historical accidents. Based on this conviction, he was critical of Meru prejudice against blacksmiths. Joseph Osuru said that the Teso think that God does not belong to other tribes or races. But he thought that God belongs to all people. He also mentioned that some Teso think that having dreams of the deceased is proof that they live in a world after death. But, he pointed out, having a dream is not proof. Peris Njuhi Muthoni said that it was good that the practice of female circumcision is dying, because it led to medical problems. She stated that it was her conviction that Luo should not remove their teeth as a rite of passage. These concrete examples show that all of the so-called “folk sages” can critique their own societies, an attribute Oruka assigned only to the “philosophic sages.”

Oruka listed “philosophic sages” in their own chapter (chap. 7). The sages included there were Okemba Simiuyu Chaungo, Oruka Rang’inya, Stephen M. Kithanje, Paul Mbuya Akoko, and Chaungo Barasa (Sage 1991 ed., 109-155). An additional aspect of the sage philosophy project was that Oruka did not want the project to stay on the descriptive level. He wanted Kenyans to read and grapple with the ideas of the sages, evaluate them, extend them, and apply them to their lives. However, his own published commentary on the interviews was brief (Trends 64-65). In Sage Philosophy, he left the job of commentary on the interviews to his student, Anthony Oseghare (Sage 1991 ed., 156-160).

D. A. Masolo made the point that it is not mere disagreement with one’s cultural group that makes one a philosophic sage, but rather that “the criterion for a moral ideal, according to the sage, is not that it match the historical belief of the community but that it satisfies an acceptable idea of right, fairness, and respectfulness toward all those who are involved or may be affected by its practical application” (Masolo "Sage"). He gave the example of a sage who would counsel against the practice of a certain ritual if it would jeopardize the health of an individual. In these circumstances, the important criteria “was not their mere variance from the communal beliefs of the sages' own groups but also a theoretical account provided by the sage as the foundation of his or her own view. . . The sage attends to the rationality of views rather than to the judgment of the group” (Masolo "Sage").

One of the tensions found within sage philosophy is that, while Oruka privileged sages critical of their societies’ prejudices, as in the examples above, on the other hand he championed sages who hold in high esteem traditional values forgotten or marginalized by young Kenyans.  In a 1979 research proposal for sage philosophy, he explained that his project was a way of defending his nation from the “invasion by foreign ideas,” which could not be stopped by guns but instead must be combated on the level of ideas. This cultural invasion included worship of technology and an adherence to crass materialism as a measure of success. Oruka bemoaned the fact that African traditional morality was already eroded by European colonialism, and their replacements, Christianity and Islam, he argued, were incapable of standing up to the cultural erosion of values ("The Philosophical").

Oruka often asked questions about the proper relationship between men and women during his interviews with sages. Many of the sages insisted that women were inferior to men. Oruka cautioned readers that the sages were reflecting the cultural prejudices of their times, and he reminded those familiar with Western philosophy that such assertions of women’s inferiority could be found as well throughout the Western canon of well-known and respected philosophers. Still, he was proud of the fact that some of his sages held relatively progressive views on this topic (Sage 1990 ed., xix-xx; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 136), and he even had one sage’s views on the topic published in a Nairobi newspaper (“Paul Mbuya"). The views asserting men’s superiority could be found in the sages interviewed by his student F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo and Ngungi Kathanga. In Oruka’s studies as well as his students’ studies, few women sages were interviewed. Gail Presbey has drawn attention to women sages in her works ("Who"; "Kenyan").

6. Criticisms of Sage Philosophy

From early on, critics from within the community of African philosophy scholars put forward their criticisms. Oruka included three critics (Bodunrin, Kaphagawani, and Keita) and three supporters (Outlaw, Oseghare, and Neugebauer) in Sage Philosophy. Peter Bondunrin said Oruka’s sages were not enough like the Greek philosophers, who expounded their view in a context of literacy (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 163-179, esp. 168-69). Lansana Keita said that when Oruka relegated creative individual thinking to the critical views of “philosophic sagacity,” he failed to acknowledge that the folk or ethnophilosophy of the community could itself be a product of earlier creative individual philosophizing (Sage 1990 ed., 210). While some of these criticisms were perhaps based on a misunderstanding of Oruka’s project (see Bewaji review 109), Oruka did appreciate the debates that ensued and responded to these critics in his own articles, which were included in the first part of the book.

After the publication of the book, criticism continued. D. A. Masolo said the sages Oruka quoted often made comments that were no more than common sense, perhaps with some cleverness thrown in, rather than sustained arguments (Masolo African Philosophy 236-245).  Ochieng’-Odhiambo had a clever and insightful response to this kind of criticism. “The idea that philosophy must always operate at a higher rarefied level with deep abstractions is not always true . . . Philosophy can, in many ways, be expressed very simply”; in fact, he agreed with Christopher Nwondo, who advocated that philosophers in Africa should attempt to write in clear and simple language (Trends 138). But Ochieng’-Odhiambo did clarify that Masolo was not against the sage philosophy project itself, but had just stated that he thought the interviews included were not yet strong enough to prove the point to his liking (Trends 137).

Tunde Bewaji reviewed Sage Philosophy and was impressed by Oruka’s sage interviews because they “reflect a clarity of thought which is not seen in ethnographic, anthropological or sociological studies” (106). While Simiyu Chaungo argued that God was the sun, because without the sun there could be no life, Ali Mwitani Masero, on page 96 of Sage Philosophy, argued that if God created the sun, God cannot also be the sun. Bewaji also commended Osuru’s criticism of popular practices that regarded dreams as evidence about the afterlife. Bewaji pointed out that many persons from so-called civilized societies still consider dreams evidence of another world. He also commended Kithanje for arguing that there could not be many gods, because such gods could not account for the uniformity of creation (106-07).

In chapter four of his book, Philosophy in an African Place, Bruce Janz reflected upon Oruka’s sage philosophy project. He noted that the approach seemed to solve the paradox of African philosophy by appealing to universal principles of reason and exploring the context of African lived experience. Yet, Oruka imported Western philosophical ideas to a large extent and left them mostly unacknowledged.  This was problematic since his project purports to be all about African philosophizing. Additionally, Janz offered critiques of the methodology.  The method at first looked promising, by focusing on conversation between sage and the interviewer (an academically trained philosopher) where the two cooperatively worked toward truth.  Yet, to Janz, it often sounded nevertheless like it was the academic philosopher who focused upon and made manifest the latent reasoning in the sage’s conversation. Janz noted that past, outmoded ethnographies turned Africans into objects of others’ studies and declared that he therefore preferred open-ended conversation. But the structure of questions that most sages were asked in interviews steered them toward certain answers that fit in the context of past Western philosophical paradigms such as asking for an essence (What is wisdom? What is virtue?). Such questions presumed that increasing levels of abstraction were abilities to be praised in a sage. Interviewers guided the sages, he argued, by eliciting the sage’s opinion on topics that the interviewer thought important.  Janz also took Oruka to task for promising to evaluate which of the sages were wise according to an objective criterion. Janz noted the complex and multiple aspects of being a wise person, and suggested that it would not be easy for anyone to sort out the wise from the not-wise. Further, Oruka did not address whether or not wisdom is a culture-bound concept. Janz suggested that wisdom was better recognized intersubjectively, identified in “a process of explicating shared meanings in a community, rather than identifying an essence” (107).

Omedi Ochieng likewise insisted that the sages be placed in a context where their speech could be understood contextually, and he found several places where Oruka failed to fill in important aspects of context. In fact he questioned the “interview” as Oruka’s chosen method, suggesting that sages might not understand an interview as a context in which to justify their philosophical beliefs when challenged by a provocateur. Adversarial debate is a particular form of philosophizing that may not be valued by the sage. But Ochieng did think that interviews with sages in some form should still be done in a “reconstructed” version of African sage philosophy (“Epistemology” 346-47, 359).

Janz similarly suggested that Oruka depended too much on the idea of philosophizing as critique and divergence from communally accepted beliefs. Why not look for other signs of wisdom, such as creative thinking? Janz found many examples of creative thinking among the sages, such as Stephen Kithanje’s “fecund metaphor of God being like heat and cold.” Likewise, Okemba Chaungo showed through his debate of the relative good of wisdom versus land that the seeming contradiction could be overcome by understanding different senses of “good” (109). In general, Janz was frustrated that sage philosophy was not more self-critical about its methods, did not come to terms with its positionality, and did not devote time to critiquing its own methods.

W. J. Ndaba critiqued Oruka’s work, arguing that the ideal of philosophy as “an individual, explicit, critical and self-critical ratiocinative consciousness” was a Western notion, since such emphasis was “counterproductive for the emergence of a genuinely rooted African philosophy” (17). He held that an African perspective would value the folk sage, that is, the person who consulted the wisdom of their community and did not try to do it alone. He referred to the Zulu proverb, Iso—elilodwa—kaliphumeleli (“An eye—when it is one—does not succeed”), to emphasize the importance of consulting other persons who could “note points of detail which elude him or unforeseen snags which turn up to mar his plan” (20-21).  He disagreed with Oruka’s claims that the philosophic sage was more valuable than the folk sage. He did, however, appreciate Oruka’s emphasis on the philosophical sage being able to warn society against holding one-sided or close-minded, ethnocentric views.

While there have been critics of sage philosophy, there have also been many scholars who have appreciated its contribution. In addition to those already mentioned above, substantive treatments of Oruka’s project can be found in the works of Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage); Sophie Oluwole, Muyiwa Falaiye and Ulrich Loelke (in Graness and Kresse), and others.

7. Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages

Oruka was convinced, both by his training in practical philosophy as well as his own sense of values and priorities, that philosophy in general, and the sage philosophy project in particular, had to address itself to the concrete problems facing Kenyans and Africans.  It should address issues in the present and suggest a course of action to make Africa’s future better.. Thus, he wanted his project to be both practical and accessible to a general audience beyond academia. He often wrote for the newspapers, such as the Daily Nation, and other popular publications. In 1986, he participated in a study sponsored by the Institute of African Studies at the University of Nairobi called “Kenya’s Socio-Political Profiles” where he was required to contribute a broad outline of the general beliefs and practices of the Luo ethnic group (Oruka Sage 1990 ed., 53, 58-61). In 1986 he became an expert witness for a now-famous trial often referred to as the S. M. Otieno burial saga. Oruka took the witness stand, and gave an account of the philosophy and practices of burial among those from the Luo ethnic group. He argued that his expertise was due to his study of so many interviews with philosophical sages from the area. He included a transcript of his evidence in court in Sage Philosophy (1990 ed., 65-80).

Note that “culture philosophy,” that is, an account of the prevailing beliefs of an ethnic community, was an offshoot of interviews aimed at discovering philosophic sagacity. In order to see how a particular sage deviated from norms in his individual, critical thinking, the sage often began by recounting reigning shared values in his community. This “offshoot” of sorts (which Oruka had before dismissed in a disparaging way as philosophy only in a broad or even “debased” sense) now became a focus. Some experts in customary law even accused Oruka of giving the court an outdated account of practices, presented as timeless truths of the Luo ethnic group (Cotran 155). When Oruka was in the witness stand, Khaminwa, Wambui Otieno’s lawyer, asked him whether in traditional society there may be people opposed to customs who want to depart from those customs and do things their own way. Oruka explained to Khaminwa that “in a traditional communal society there were very few rebels” (Sage 1990 ed., 70). He minimized the existence and role of such dissent, even though in his academic work on sage philosophy he particularly championed such dissent.

Rather than see him as taking on the role of ethnophilosopher, Ochieng’-Odhiambo suggested that, at that point, Oruka showed that he himself was a philosophic sage able to recount the traditions of his ethnic group while also resolving any inconsistencies (Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 125). Masolo thought that Oruka’s popularity grew because of his role in the trial, due to his ability to unmask the faulty logic of the widow’s defense team that equated “modern” with “Western” in a stereotypical and unfair way ("Sage"). Be that as it may, the court case can also be seen as another missed opportunity for Oruka to champion the rights of women in a male-dominated context (Presbey, 2012, 2013).

The court case was the beginning of a new phase in Oruka’s sage research. As Oruka explained, due to his notoriety in the case, he was offered work sensitizing District Officers and Commissioners to Luo philosophy and customs. When he gave these talks, he reiterated common beliefs among the Luos and quoted individual philosophical sages (Sage 1990 ed., 58-64). He also put his sage sources to use when studying Kenyan beliefs and practices regarding family planning, for the Department of Populations. He had two control groups, non-sages and sages, and gave the views of both. His main point was that Kenyan traditions and values already had the resources for population control through natural family planning.  Further, a sensitive study of the culture of Kenyan people could reveal attitudes and practices that worked against family planning and then point the way to solutions to the problem. Here he seemed to have crossed over quite a bit into the social sciences. Dorothy Munyakho explained that his approach was still considered experimental and controversial from the perspective of people in Population Studies who were more familiar with demographics and statistics than with qualitative analysis of interview content (21).

Critic Didier Kaphagawani, in a 1987 article reprinted in Sage Philosophy, charged sage philosophy with being parasitic on ethnophilosophy, insofar as philosophic sages practiced second-order reflection and analysis of first-order ethnophilosophy (Kaphagawani in Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 181-204). But Oruka responded and clarified. He said instead that philosophic sagacity is second order to culture philosophy. Sages reflect upon the culture, though not as it is summarized in consensus form and analyzed by professional philosophers, theologians, or missionaries (as in ethnophilosophy); rather, they do so based on their first-hand observations of the culture philosophy through their personal experiences in the community (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). This same point could serve as a fine-tuned criticism of Momoh’s terminology mentioned above, since Momoh sometimes referred to ethnophilosophy and communal philosophy without distinction. Momoh added the helpful point that all communal philosophies, not just African communal philosophies, are non-critical, and he gave some examples from Britain (The Substance 59, 63).

In an article, “Sage Philosophy Revisited,” based on a radio interview in 1993 and published posthumously, Oruka noted that some scholars considered his project “just one of the brands of ethnophilosophy,” similar to Mbiti and others, and disagreed with those critics (Practical 183). He agreed that he studied “culture philosophy” and described it as the “beliefs, practices, myths, taboos, and general values of a people” (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). To the end, Oruka trusted his method more than that of ethnophilosophers like Tempels because he based his accounts of culture philosophy on the testimony of trusted indigenous experts (the philosophical sages), and he considered himself to be conveying only what they had told him (Sage 1990 ed., 57; 1991 ed., 43n2). Of course, there is no escaping one’s role in shaping the data insofar as the researcher, even Oruka himself, decides which parts of which interviews to highlight when presenting them to others. This methodological point was raised by Emmanuel Eze regarding Oruka’s work (Eze and Lewis 19).

It’s important to note that as time went on, ethnophilosophy’s staunchest critic, Paulin Hountondji, modified his position.  He reflected on the debate that was started by his criticism of ethnophilosophy and said in 2002 that his earlier rejection of collective thought was excessive. He explained that collective culture must be taken seriously, and that individuality is fashioned from a basic personality, which has rootedness. While he agreed that individual thought should be seen in cultural context, he noted that it should not be stuck there. Roots should not become a “prison house” (The Struggle 128, 151-52, 204-05). Also, one of Hountondji’s biggest complaints about the ethnophilosophers like Tempels was that they were foreigners, or if not foreigners, at least they were writing for a foreign audience, responding to debates and criteria created abroad. Hountondji called this “extroversion,” and wanted instead to have African philosophy being written by Africans and responding to the interests and needs of Africans (“Introduction”). Certainly, the trajectory of Oruka’s interests in the sages showed that over time, the issue of proving anything to outsiders diminished in importance, as the question of how sage wisdom and reflection could help Kenya and Africa took center stage (Ochieng’-Odhiambo "The Tripartite" 21, "The Evolution" 29, and "Philosophic" 78; Kalumba 39-40; Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria").

8. Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years

Oruka intended his sage philosophy project to continue to grow. He called his 1992 book, on former Vice-President of Kenya Jaramogi Oginga Odinga, a continuing study in sage philosophy (Practical 162). In many respects, Oginga Odinga was quite different than the other sages, insofar as he was literate, had formal education and extensive experience in government (being first vice president of Kenya and later a presidential candidate) and had also traveled abroad.  Nevertheless, Oruka insisted that in Oginga Odinga’s role as ker, that is, spiritual and cultural leader of the Luo people, he maintained with the other sages an important commitment to the betterment of his community. Oruka also clarified that, while he had begun his sage philosophy research interviewing illiterate elder sages, because their testimony might soon be lost, he never intended his project to be limited to the illiterate, elderly or rural persons. Thus, speculations that his project would become out of date the more that literacy spread in Africa were based on a misunderstanding of his project (Sage 1990 ed., xviii). Indeed, in Sage Philosophy, he included an interview of one young, educated sage, Chaungo Barasa (a water engineer), due to his wisdom and his commitment to his community (1990 ed., 149-57).

Oruka articulated and emphasized other reasons to continue sage philosophy as a project, including the need for a generation of Kenyans who grew up in cities to remain connected to their roots. He was also concerned with the practical challenges of poverty and corruption and curtailment of liberties in Kenya. He thought that sages, from the obscure rural ones to the more famous ones like Oginga Odinga, could offer a bold moral critique of Kenyan society that could help people improve their lives both individually and as a community and nation.

Oruka’s life was cut short in a road accident in December of 1995. As a pedestrian, he was struck down by a motorist in the streets of Nairobi (Nation Reporter 40). Further studies in sage philosophy have certainly been stymied by this loss but not wholly halted. Anke Graness and Kai Kresse quickly assembled scholars to comment on sage philosophy’s legacy in a memorial book to Oruka that came out shortly after his death, Sagacious Reasoning. A book of essays that Oruka had been working on at the time of his death, Practical Philosophy, was subsequently published. This book divided Oruka’s essays into four sections, one on African philosophy and culture and the other three covering issues of truth and faith, value and ideology, and environmental ethics. Excerpts of sage interviews can be found in some collections on African philosophy (see Oruka’s interview of Paul Mbuya Akoko in Hord and Lee 32-44).

9. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students

To explore the ongoing influence of sage philosophy, it’s best to cast a wide net. While “philosophic sagacity” was a specialized part of sage philosophy, the project also included folk sages and culture philosophy. It makes sense to survey those who found Oruka’s emphasis on the interview process central to their own work in African philosophy. Some of these persons did not mind drawing upon interviews as well as proverbs. Many provided extensive historical background and filled in details of the context of those they interviewed to a far greater extent than Oruka ever did in his studies, and they did so for good methodological reasons. Some refined the interview method beyond Oruka’s own practice, going more in-depth, refraining from misleading questions, and some even preferred participant observation to interview. With all of these variations, it is best to understand these works as influenced by Oruka and perhaps even as improvements on his project, rather than as strict copies.

This survey will begin with those who had been Oruka’s own graduate students. Most published work beyond their original theses and many became scholars in their own right. During Oruka’s time at University of Nairobi, MA and PhD students such as Kenyans Ngungi Kathanga, Oriare Nyarwath, Patrick Dikirr, F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo ("The Significance"), Wairimu Gichohi, and Nigerian Anthony Oseghare  incorporated sage philosophy as a topic and/or interviews with sages into their studies while under Oruka’s supervision. Some of them published articles sharing their research with others. Oseghare’s thesis reiterated many points of Oruka’s own position—holding  a universalist definition of philosophy, limiting investigation to texts that met the philosophical standards of being critical, rigorous and of a second-order activity—and  analyzed three sages according to this criteria. Two of the sages appeared in Oruka’s book, and Oseghare’s commentary on those two sages was excerpted and included in Sage Philosophy. But the thesis included discussion of a third sage, Oigara from the Kisii community. Oseghare liked Oigara best because unlike Oruka Rang’inya (who happened to be Oruka’s father) who explained the psychology behind “explaining events through the activities of spirits as a ploy of encouraging good behavior,” Oigara instead directly appealed to individuals' abilities to make rational judgments (Oseghare xii). Oseghare concluded that the sages met his criteria for philosophical thinking.

Gichohi analyzed the interviews of sages included in Sage Philosophy (1991), finding contradictions in the concepts and positions held by some of the sages regarding their concepts of God.  For starters, she questioned why Paul Mbuya Akoko said there must be one god to account for the orderliness of the universe.  According to Gichohi, Mbuya begged the question, for who is to say that many gods must take on a mischievous character? (89). She also noted that Mbuya said that no one really knows God but later affirmed that God exists and rules nature (91). She noted that Oruka Rang'inya was involved in a contradiction between God being a concept and God's living in the wind (93). She further was concerned that M'Mukindia Kithanje's interpretation of God as present at the biological process of procreation confused the mysterious or marvelous with God (94). When it came to their ideas for the improvement of society, Gichohi found some of the sages' suggestions problematic.  Gichohi was particularly concerned with Mbuya Akoko's suggestion that a criminal should be administered a drug during which time he could be reformed.  She expressed her skepticism that such a procedure would reform the individual.  Since being subjected to such drugs involuntarily is dehumanizing, how could one be reformed while his humanity has been eroded?  In addition, Mbuya did not explain what type of offender and under what circumstance the punishment should be administered.  These are all very important objections to the procedure which were not even questioned during the interview (103-04).  Likewise, when Simiyu said that illness is due to laziness, his view, although perhaps sometimes true, could not count for all cases, such as physical destruction and disease brought on by earthquakes and other large-scale calamities not caused by humans. (131-32).

Ochieng’-Odhiambo described in his thesis and subsequent articles that his efforts were aimed at exploring “philosophic sagacity” to prove to skeptics that Africans can philosophize. For this reason, he explained, “my efforts were channeled toward presenting the thoughts of some sages in an elaborate and rarefied manner. More specifically, I concentrated on those topics that had been the focus of most ancient Greek philosophers” ("The Tripartite" 18). By proceeding in such a way, he would not only “uncoil” the philosophical ideas and logic of the sages but also “show beyond the shadow of a doubt that philosophers existed in traditional Africa” ("The Tripartite" 19). As Ochieng’-Odhiambo explained in a 1997 article that presented some of his 1994 dissertation’s findings, “The rationale of my approach was that if the thoughts of the pre-Socratics are philosophical (and this is never doubted) and if the African (Kenyan) sages think in a similar manner, then they should also be granted the prestige of being philosophical” ("Philosophic" 174). Oruka himself made references to the sages being at least as good as the pre-Socratics (Sage 1990 ed., xv-xvi, xxv, 37), so Ochieng’-Odhiambo was clearly following Oruka’s lead. The rest of the article, based on the research he did for his dissertation, involved interviewing sages and asking them, for example, questions on change and permanence. Ochieng’-Odhiambo asked Rose Ondhewe Odhiambo whether things change or are permanent (in obvious reference to the Parmenides and Heraclitus paradox). She gave a nuanced answer: some things change more than they are permanent, and some are more permanent and change little. Certainly she used reason and put forward a rational view. Ochieng’-Odhiambo went on to interview a man, Naftali Ong’alo, who when asked what the single most important element is, argued that “water is the single most important thing in the universe” (“Philosophic” 175-77).

It’s possible to raise some methodological questions regarding the approach in Ochieng’-Odhaimbo’s early works. The problem of asking “leading questions,” whether pursued intentionally or not, is a real one for any interviewer; Ochieng’-Odhaimbo himself addressed the dangers of leading questions in another work of his (Trends 132-33). While his studies with Oruka were in the 1990s, he continued to address African Philosophy in general, and sage philosophy in particular, as a key topic in his philosophical writings. He gave a thorough account of Oruka’s sage project in his 2002 and 2006 articles, and in his 2010 book (Trends 115-150).

Patrick Maison Dikirr published some findings from his 1994 master’s thesis which he wrote under Oruka’s supervision. Dikirr interviewed Maasai sages on the topic of death. As Dikirr explained, by discussing death, certain ideas, values, or lessons were reinforced about life. There were ambiguous practices among the Maasais, some of which seemed to argue for an idea of the afterlife. For example, when a Maasai person saw a snake (black python or cobra) in a hut of someone who has recently died, they fed it milk, greeted it, and told it, “We are always together!”  After all, the snake may be a deceased important person such as an oloiboni (diviner), a great chief or counselor, or a wealthy man. But Dikirr wondered further, were snakes fed just to avert their anger, so that humans could survive?  Or, were there ethical lessons contained in the treatment of snakes, such as: do not despise strangers who may show up to one’s house? He preferred that these lessons be the real reason behind the stories. Likewise, Maasais thought that waking someone suddenly from deep sleep should be discouraged, because the spirit travels while sleeping. But, Dikirr preferred to understand this practice as a focus on the ethical values of politeness and humility toward others. Dikirr thought the Maasai conception of self was closer to the Aristotelean unitary self-experience. He found evidence to show that Maasais thought there was a permanent end to life. The dead are no longer around. The only thing left after death is how one’s personality affects the children. A person who has children will not easily fade from memory like the single person who dies without children. Here, immortality is understood as a name to remember.

Ngungi Kathanga wrote a master’s thesis on philosophic sagacity at UON in 1992. Seven male (and no female) sages, all Kikuyus from Kirinyaga district, were included in Kathanga’s study. He explained that he originally interviewed fifty women and men (he does not mention how many of the fifty were women), but only the seven men included were judged by him to be sages (96). He included three sages’ responses to questions of men and women’s equality. All three said men were superior to women. All pointed out her physical weakness, and some added other weaknesses. Mwangi Wangu stated that women are unable to keep secrets.  But he said they are respected for their roles as child-bearers, because through the naming of children, the dead survive. Joel Rukenya said women cannot rise up to tough challenges in life, and therefore should not be put in positions of power (122-24). The sages are, however, quoted as supporting racial equality (128-131).

Regarding Oginga Odinga, Peter Ogola Onyango of Moi University claims that a philosophic sage must first become a folk sage before he or she can become a philosophic sage. He then argues that Oginga Odinga proves his ability to be a folk sage by the fact that he is chosen as Ker of the Luo. Ogola Onyango then shows that Oginga Odinga is a philosophic sage because he disagreed with popular opinion of many Luos during the S. M. Otieno burial trial, when he claimed that it is fine for Luos to be buried anywhere in Kenya (240-42).

Oriare Nyarwath analyzed several of Oruka’s sages on the topic of freedom (Nyarwath in Graness and Kresse 211-218). He went on to write a PhD thesis in 2009 on Oruka’s philosophical works which included his review of the sage philosophy project’s purpose and methodology, but he did not include interviews of sages or commentary upon Oruka’s sage interviews (139-161, 247-48). Instead, the thesis focused on the question of Oruka’s commitments and overarching themes throughout his published works.

Also, students at Tangaza College in Nairobi’s Maryknoll Institute of African Studies program were regularly offered a course in sage philosophy, earlier taught by Oruka himself, then by F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo, and later, by Oriare Nyarwath (Maryknoll "Sage Philosophy"). These students continued to interview sages; their reports can be found in the Tangaza College library. In the earlier years, that is, in the 1990s, reports were almost always accompanied by transcripts of the interviews. But after around 2000, the number of student papers containing the transcript of the interviews declined. Either students gave short quotes of the interviews, or they only referred to interviews without giving any direct quotes.

10. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars

Kai Kresse’s book, Philosophising in Mombasa, got its inspiration from Oruka’s project. Kresse explained that he was seeking knowledge about knowledge in the context of the Muslim community living on Kenya's Swahili coast. He wanted to study the self-reflexive, critical knowledge of local thinkers there. His book contained three in-depth portraits of local elder intellectuals and several briefer portraits of younger thinkers.  Kresse explained how his methodology differed from Oruka’s.  Unlike Oruka, Kresse did not center his study on direct questions put to each thinker interviewed, but instead observed the intellectuals during their philosophical discourses with members of their community.  Kresse himself became fluent in Swahili so that he could follow such discussions directly, and read the scholars’ lectures, poetry and other writings. He lived in the Mombasa Old Town community so that he could be socially accepted and therefore placed in situations to hear and document the most interesting discussions. Kresse also helped his readers by describing the historical, religious and cultural context in which the debates occurred, as well as the personal biographies of the participants. But like Oruka and Brenner, Kresse saw a key part of his work as documenting “the utterances of the intellectuals” (31; Brenner). While Kresse added his own interpretation, he provided clear demarcation to his commentary, so that the reader could accept or reject the interpretations offered.

Kresse then followed with several chapters, each focusing on a particular thinker.  Ahmed Sheikh Nabhany had as his goal the preservation of all that was good in Swahili traditions. Through poetry he was able to use his creative skills to communicate the basics of Islamic practices as well as moral guidelines and cultural practices. Nabhany was active in his proposals for preservation of a moral code that was losing ground in contemporary society. In his next chapter Kresse explored Ahmad Nassir, who in his poem “Utenzi wa Mtu ni Utu” summed up a moral code that involved respecting all human beings, that provided guidelines for distinguishing between good and bad actions, and that offered a way to measure moral status. Kresse considered Nassir to be an innovator insofar as he constructed a theory of utu (humaneness) and formulated sub-concepts that enforce utu. The next chapter focused on Sheikh Abdilahi Nassir’s Ramadan lectures. Kresse argued that Abdilahi was a sage, referring to Oruka’s use of the term in the context of his sage philosophy project. Abdulahi’s practice of rethinking his own positions on issues of dire importance to his community, and the extent of his conscious effort to clarify his ideas, made Abdulahi’s practices a clear example of philosophizing (206-07).

Kresse followed the book with an article in 2008 that engaged in a study of the concept of wisdom, based on two Swahili sages. He argued that a person is identified as wise if they are able to make others see the world in a different light or from a new perspective. He argued that wisdom required social performance and interaction ("Can," 194, 199).

Workineh Kelbessa, a philosopher from Ethiopia who had met Oruka and was inspired by his project, used Oruka's interview method to gain knowledge about environmental values among the Oromo of Ethiopia. He wrote a book about his findings. His work drew upon culture philosophy as well as the insights of philosophic sages. He explained, “In this work, the term ‘indigenous environmental ethics’ is used sometimes to refer to the ethical views of philosophic sages who have their own independent views, and in most cases it is used as a plural (of ‘environmental ethic’) to refer to the norms and values of various Oromo groups and of other indigenous peoples” (ch. 1). His objective was to “show how indigenous knowledge systems can serve as a critical resource base for the process of development and a healthy environment.” He cautioned that he did not intend to engage in uncritical, nostalgic acceptance of Oromo indigenous knowledge.  He used various sources, but depended most upon “interviewing, focus group discussion and observation” because they “enable us to understand values and attitudes of the people towards the environment at a level inaccessible to a questionnaire.” He interviewed peasant farmers and pastoralists to learn about their concepts of time and divination, their ecotheology, and their attitudes toward wild animals, forests, and agriculture (ch. 1). His study drew upon many proverbs.

A further sage philosophy study which attempted to apply the insights gained from sage philosophy to the topic of a new national culture for Kenya was written by Chaungo Barasa, who helped Oruka conduct his sage philosophy interviews. Chaungo argued that cultural practices needed to be connected to consistent thoughts and belief systems.  He suggested Kenyans re-examine their lives and cultures in five areas:  the intersection/harmonization of tradition and modernity, death and burial ceremonies, marriage and inheritance, inter-family and clan relations, and leadership and role-modeling.  All of this could be attained with the help of sage philosophy, which encouraged people to pursue wisdom and reflect on their beliefs.  The family taught moral behavior, he noted; however, in Kenya’s modern families (making up about 35 percent of the population) there was, he argued, a lack of morality. “Modern” Kenyans, he wrote, held a flawed concept of modernity, equating it with European culture and religion, and their understanding of that culture was rudimentary and incoherent.  Chaungo maintained that the modern Kenyan also had a stunted understanding of indigenous cultures and traditions; in their place were materialism, and consumerism, and status.  They barely masked their distaste for rural folk and environment, Chaungo argued; yet, they engaged in gender oppression which contradicted modernity.  Also, modern Kenyans were easily manipulated and bought by various politicians.  Such a description showed that philosophical reflection upon tradition was mandatory in order for society to become productive and coherent.

Oral historian E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo’s article “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development:  Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya” (2000) analyzed and evaluated books and pamphlets written by these two sages. Paul Mbuya Akoko, interviewed by Oruka and included in Sage Philosophy, was also a writer.  This article met the two criteria of quoting individual sages, and engaging in critical analysis. Since the sages addressed the topic of development, the thrust of the article also fit in with Oruka’s expressed goals for his sage philosophy project. Mbuya was not the only sage included in Oruka’s Sage Philosophy who had written down his own ideas, and yet Oruka did not analyze the written works of the sages he included in his study.

In his “Conversations with Luo Sages,” D. A. Masolo recorded a conversation of pressing issues of the day in which a sage takes center stage, and in which Masolo was a participant but did not direct the conversation. Masolo considered this an example of participant observation, which, according to some anthropologists, could be a more reliable source of texts for understanding African philosophy than interviews. Masolo included this conversation transcript in his book Self and Community (255-60) because it shed light on contemporary moral debate in Kenya. While not explicitly expressed, what “emerged” during the conversation was the question of whether the worth of abstract moral principles “ought to be judged independently of any real situation” (263). Masolo then further analyzed the issues raised, in the context of moral positions expressed by Kant, Hume, and Wiredu. In another part of the same work, Masolo drew upon the insights of a sage interviewed by Oruka, Paul Mbuya Akoko. He found these to express helpful ideas for grounding the ethics of communalism, described by the sage as, in Masolo’s words, “a norm arrived at for purposes of affecting order in the lives of people by reducing social differences and promoting peace” (50). Masolo could be seen as a contemporary advocate and practitioner of a variant of sage philosophy.  His methods focused not on interviews of a sage by a researcher, but rather the analysis of discourse at various public fora in which the sages gathered, such as “palavers,” public debates and negotiations. In these contexts, sages used their mental skills and were involved in sustained critical inquiry ("Sage Philosophy").

Richard Bell’s book, Understanding African Philosophy, devoted a section to Oruka’s sage philosophy. He wanted to take Oruka’s project further by exploring oral philosophy as an example of narrative and Socratic discourse found not only in the texts of sages but also in everyday discourse and village palavers (32-35, 111-12).). For Bell, philosophy in Africa had to be tied to the experience of the lived reality of Africa, which was made up of the pre-colonial traditions of Africa, and its colonial history, current harsh circumstances, and human struggles (35). Bell analogized to Plato’s dialogues, such as Euthyphro, where, in the context of everyday life, circumstances give rise to philosophical dilemmas.  Sages similarly prompted to engage in discussion as well as deep thought, and they grappled with situations which gave rise to what Bell called the “narrative ‘stuff’ of philosophy” (112).

Bekele Gutema argued that sage philosophy’s method was particularly productive in exploring topics of conflict resolution, such as crises of democracy, problems of ruling elites and corruption, and ethnic strife. Sages emphasized solutions that addressed the needs and perspectives of all parties, having as their goals the harmony between people as well as between people and nature. He added what he knew about elders being involved in reconciliation from his own experience (208-11). Presbey interviewed sages with these themes in mind. She found sages in both Kenya and Ghana who shared their insights into conflict, whether interpersonal or ethnic, and their procedures for bringing estranged parties together. She quoted from her interviews with the sages and evaluated their insights (Presbey “Contemporary African Sages"; “Philosophic Sages"; “Sage Philosophy and Critical Thinking").

Charles Verharen of Howard University engaged in a project which combined Oruka’s sage philosophy project with the methods of Claude Sumner, S.J., the scholar who studied Ethiopian philosophy while living there for 45 years. Verharen noted that Sumner, following the suggestion of Alain Locke, enlisted the aid of linguists and anthropologists to do his philosophical work, something that Oruka did not do, but that Verharen considered essential to his project. Verharen engaged in interviews both among the Oromo and, with the help of Rianna Oelofsen of University of Fort Hare, South Africa, among the Xhosa and San. Verharen explained that he was drawn to study sage philosophy out of concerns for cultural survival as well as philosophy’s survival, as he searched for “better stories to tell” in a world where human survival was jeopardized (83-88). He suggested interviewing both those known as sages and a broader group drawn from all parts of the society, questioning them in such a way as to reveal their level of critical rationality (75-76).

Kazeem likewise suggests that sage philosophy research should continue with slight modifications in order that philosophers can salvage “indigenous epistemologies threatened with extinction” and thereby contribute to a “polycentric global epistemology” (200). Kazeem names his approach “hermeneutico-reconstructionism” and asserts that it can be used to solve Africa’s current problems (200-01).

Oruka’s contribution to the field of African philosophy was substantial, and his influence is ongoing, as sage research continues.

11. References and Further Reading

  • Abraham, W. E. The Mind of Africa. Chicago: U of Chicago P, 1962.
  • Atieno-Odhiambo, E. S. “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development: Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya.” African Philosophy as Cultural Inquiry. Ed Ivan Karp and D. A. Masolo. Bloomington: Indiana UP, 2000. 244–258.  African Systems of Thought.
  • Azenabor, Godwin. "Odera Oruka’s Philosophic Sagacity: Problems and Challenges of Conversation Method in African Philosophy.” Premier Issue. Spec. issue of Thought and Practice: A Journal of the Philosophical Association of Kenya ns 1.1 (June 2009): 69-86.
  • Azenabor, Godwin. Understanding the Problems in African Philosophy. Second Edition. Lagos, Nigeria: First Academic Publishers, 2002.
  • Bell, Richard H. Understanding African Philosophy: A Cross-Cultural Approach to Classical and Contemporary Issues. New York: Routledge, 2002.
  • Bewaji, Tunde. Rev. of Sage Philosophy, ed. H. Odera Oruka. Quest: Philosophical Discussions 7.1 (June 1994): 104-111.
  • Brenner, Louis. West African Sufi: The Religious Heritage and Spiritual Search of Cerno Bokar Saalif Taal. London: C. Hurst, 1984.
  • Chaungo, Barasa. “Narrowing the Gap between Past Practices and Future Thoughts in a Transitional Kenyan Cultural Model, for Sustainable Family Livelihood Security (FLS).” Presbey, et al. Thought and Practice 217–222.
  • Cotran, E. “The Future of Customary Law in Kenya.” The S. M. Otieno Case: Death and Burial in Modern Kenya. Ed. J. B. Ojwang and J. N. K. Mugambi. Kenya: Nairobi UP, 1989. 149-165.
  • Dikirr, Patrick Maison. "The Philosophy and Ethics Concerning Death and Disposal of the Dead Among the Maasai." MA Thesis U of Nairobi, 1994.
  • Donders, J. G. “Don’t Fence Us In: The Liberating Role of Philosophy." 11th Inaugural Lecture. University of Nairobi. 10 March 1977. Nairobi: Joseph Gerard Publication, U of Nairobi, 1977.
  • Eze, Emmanuel, and Rick Lewis. “African Philosophy at the Turn of the Millennium: Rick Lewis in Dialogue with Emmanuel Chukwudi Eze.” Polylog: Forum for Intercultural Philosophizing 1.1 (2000): 1-28.
  • Gichohi, Wairimu. “Indigenous African Philosophical Knowledge: A Critique.” MA Thesis U of Nairobi, 1996.
  • Goody, Jack. Rev. of Conversations with Ogotemmeli: An Introduction to Dogon Religious Ideas, by Marcel Griaule. American Anthropologist n.s. 69.2 (April 1967): 239-41.
  • Graness, Anke, and Kai Kresse, eds. Sagacious Reasoning: Henry Odera Oruka in Memoriam. Frankfurt am Main: Lang, 1997.  Nairobi: East African Educational, 1999.  (Page numbers are the same).
  • Gutema, Bekele. “The Role of Sagacity in Resolving Conflicts Peacefully.” Presbey, Thought and Practice 207-216.
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  • Kazeem, Fayemi Ademola “H. Odera Oruka and the Question of Methodology in African Philosophy: A Critique.” Thought and Practice: A Journal of the Philosophical Association of Kenya ns 4.2 (December 2012): 185-204.
  • Kelbessa, Workineh. Indigenous and Modern Environmental Ethics: A Study of the Indigenous Oromo Environmental Ethic and Modern Issues of Environment and Development. Washington, D.C.: Council for Research and Values in Philosophy, 2009.
  • Kelbessa, Workineh. “Logic in Ethiopian Philosophical and Sapiential Literature.” Sumner and Yohannes 109-116.
  • Kresse, Kai. “Can Wisdom be Taught?: Kant, Sage Philosophy, and Ethnographic Reflections from the Swahili Coast.” Teaching for Wisdom : Cross-Cultural Perspectives on Fostering Wisdom. Ed. Michel Ferrari and Georges Potworowski. Dordrecht: Springer, 2008. 187-202.
  • Kresse, Kai. Philosophising in Mombasa: Knowledge, Islam and Intellectual Practice on the Swahili Coast. Edinburgh: Edinburgh UP, 2007.  International African Library 35.
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  • Makinde, M. Akin.“Robin Horton’s ‘Philosophy’: An Outline of Intellectual Error,” University of Ife, Nigeria. 20 June 1978. Reading.
  • Maryknoll Institute of African Studies. “Sage Philosophy: The Root of African Philosophy and Religion.” 2013-14 Course Catalog.
  • Masolo, D. A. African Philosophy in Search of an Identity. Bloomington: Indiana UP, 1994.
  • Masolo, D. A. “African Sage Philosophy,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Spring 2006 ed.
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  • Masolo, D. A. “Sage Philosophy,” New Dictionary of the History of Ideas. Farmington Hills, MI: Gale, 2005.
  • Masolo, D. A. Self and Community in a Changing World. Bloomington: Indiana UP, 2010.
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  • Momoh, Campbell Shittu, ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi, Nigeria: African Philosophy Projects, 1989. See esp. “Issues in African Philosophy” by Momoh.
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  • Nyarwath, Oriare.“Philosophy and Rationality in Taboos, with Special Reference to the Kenyan Luo Culture”. MA thesis U of Nairobi, 1994.
  • Ochieng, Omedi. "The Epistemology of African Philosophy: Sagacious Knowledge and the Call for a Critical and Contextual Epistemology." International Philosophical Quarterly 48.3 (September 2008): 337-59.
  • Ochieng, Omedi. "The Ideology of African Philosophy: The Silences and Possibilities of African Rhetorical Knowledge." Silence and Listening as Rhetorical Arts. Ed. Cheryl Glenn and Krista Ratcliffe. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 2011. 147-162.
  • Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Fredrick. “The Evolution of Sagacity: the Three Stages of Odera Oruka’s Philosophy.” Philosophia Africana 5.1 (March 2002): 19-32.
  • Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Fredrick. “Philosophic Sagacity: Aims and Functions.” Caribbean Journal of Philosophy 1.1 (2009).
  • Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Fredrick. “Philosophic Sagacity Revisited.” Graness and Kresse 171-79.
  • Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Fredrick. “The Significance of Philosophic Sagacity in African Philosophy”. PhD thesis, U of Nairobi, 1994.
  • Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Fredrick. “Some Basic Issues about Philosophic Sagacity: Twenty Years Later.” Sumner and Yohannes 64-75.
  • Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Fredrick. Trends and Issues in African Philosophy. New York: Peter Lang, 2010.
  • Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Fredrick. “The Tripartite in Sagacity,” Philosophia Africana 9.1 (March 2006): 17-34.
  • Oruka, Henry Odera. “Ethics, Beliefs, and Attitudes Affecting Family Planning in Kenya Today.” Report. Inst. of Population Studies, U of Nairobi, 1989.
  • Oruka, Henry Odera. “The Fundamental Principles in the Question of ‘African Philosophy’ I.” Second Order 4.1 (January 1975): 44-55.
  • Oruka, Henry Odera. “Grundlegende Fragen der Afrikanischen Sage-Philosophy.” Vier Fragen Zur Philosophie in Afrika, Asien und Lateinamerika. Ed Franz M. Wimmer. Vienna: Passagen, 1988. 35ff.
  • Oruka, Henry Odera. “Paul Mbuya the Sage Philosopher.” Sunday Nation 17 May 1981: 17.
  • Oruka, Henry Odera. “The Philosophical Roots of Culture in Western Kenya.” Grant proposal, in possession of the author. [1979?] (For corroboration of the date, see Ochieng’-Odhiambo 2002, 29).
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Author Information

Gail M. Presbey
University of Detroit Mercy
U. S. A.

Wiredu, Kwasi

Kwasi Wiredu (1931- )

Kwasi Wiredu is a philosopher from Ghana, who has for decades been involved with a project he terms “conceptual decolonization” in contemporary African systems of thought.  By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two aims.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavory aspects of tribal culture embedded in modern African thought so as to make that thought more viable.  Second, he intends to dislodge unnecessary Western epistemologies that are to be found in African philosophical practices.

In previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topical issue both at the highest theoretical levels and also at the basic level of everyday existence. After African countries attained political liberation, decolonization became an immediate and overwhelming preoccupation.  A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways.  The disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature, and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic conundrums of decolonization.

A central purpose in this article is to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophy in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In this light, it sometimes appears that African philosophy has been quite limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization has been rightly conceived as a vast, global, and trans-disciplinary enterprise.

This analysis involves an examination of both the limitations and immense possibilities of Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization.  First, the article offers a close reading of the theory itself and then locates it within the broader movement of modern African thought.  In several instances, Wiredu’s theory has proved seminal to the advancement of contemporary African philosophical practices.  It is also necessary to be aware of current imperatives of globalization, nationality, and territoriality and how they affect the agency of a theory such as ideological/conceptual decolonization.  Indeed, the notion of decolonization is far more complex than is often assumed.  Consequently, the epistemological resources by which it can be apprehended as a concept, ideology, or process are multiple and diverse.  Lastly, this article, as a whole, represents a reflection on the diversity of the dimensions of decolonization.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Early Beginnings
  3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice
  4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development
  5. An African Reading of Karl Marx
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Kwasi Wiredu is one of Africa’s foremost philosophers, and he has done a great deal to establish the discipline of philosophy, in its contemporary shape, as a credible area of intellection in most parts of the African continent and beyond.  In order to appreciate the conceptual and historical contexts of his work, it is necessary to possess some familiarity with relevant discourses in African studies and history, anthropology, literature and postcolonial theory, particularly those advanced by Edward W. Said, Gayatri Spivak, Homi Bhabha, Abiola Irele and Biodun Jeyifo.  Wiredu’s contribution to the making of modern African thought provides an interesting insight into the processes involved in the formation of postcolonial disciplines and discourses, and it can also be conceived as a counter-articulation to the hegemonic discourses of imperial domination.

 Wiredu, for many decades, was involved with a project he termed conceptual decolonization in contemporary African systems of thought. This term entailed, for Wiredu, a re-examination of current African epistemic foundations in order to accomplish two main objectives.  First, he intended to undermine counter-productive facets of tribal cultures embedded in modern African, thought so as to make this body of thought both more sustainable and more rational.  Second, he intended to deconstruct the unnecessary Western epistemologies which may be found in African philosophical practices.

A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways. In particular, the disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic challenges inherent to decolonization.

It is usually profitable to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophers comparatively (along with other African thinkers who are not professional philosophers) in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In addition to the scholars noted above, the discourse of decolonialization has benefitted from many valuable contributions made by intellectuals such as Frantz Fanon, Leopold Sedar Senghor, Cheikh Anta Diop, and Ngugi wa Thiongo.  In this light, it would appear that African philosophy has been, at certain moments, limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature, postcolonial theory and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization, as Ngugi wa Thiongo, the Kenyan cultural theorist and novelist, notes, must be conceived as a broad, transcontinental, and multidisciplinary venture.

Within the Anglophone contingent of African philosophy, the analytic tradition of British philosophy continues to be dominant.  This discursive hegemony had led an evident degree of parochialism.  This in turn has led to the neglect of many other important intellectual traditions.  For instance, within this Anglophonic sphere, there is not always a systematic interrogation of the limits, excesses and uses of colonialist anthropology in formulating the problematic of identity.  In this regard, the problematic of identity does not only refer to the question of personal agency but more broadly, the challenges of discursive identity.  This shortcoming is not as evident in Francophone traditions of African philosophy, which usually highlight the foundational discursive interactions between anthropology and modern African thought.  Thus, in this instance, there is an opening to other discursive formations necessary for the nurturing a vibrant philosophical practice.  Also, within Anglophone African philosophy, a stringent critique of imperialism and contemporary globalization does not always figure is not always significantly in the substance of the discourse, thereby further underlining the drawbacks of parochialism.  As such, it is necessary for critiques of Wiredu’s corpus to move beyond its ostensible frame to include critiques and discussions of traditions of philosophical practice outside the Anglophone divide of modern African thought (Osha, 2005).  Accordingly, such critiques ought not merely be a celebration of post-structuralist discourses to the detriment of African intellectual traditions.  Instead, they should be, among other things, an exploration of the discursive intimacies between the Anglophone and Francophone traditions of African philosophy.  In addition, an interrogation of other borders of philosophy is required to observe the gains that might accrue to the Anglophone movement of contemporary African philosophy, which, in many ways, has reached a discursive dead-end due to its inability to surmount the intractable problematic of identity, and its endless preoccupation with the question of its origins. These are the sort of interrogations that readings of Wiredu’s work necessitate. Furthermore, a study of Wiredu’s corpus (Osha, 2005) identifies—if only obliquely—the necessity to re-assess the importance of other discourses such as colonialist anthropology and various philosophies of black subjectivity in the formation of the modern African subject.  These are some of the central concerns which appear in Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa (2005).

2. Early Beginnings

Kwasi Wiredu was born in 1931 in Ghana and had his first exposure to philosophy quite early in life.  He read his first couple of books of philosophy in school around 1947 in Kumasi, the capital of Ashanti.  These books were Bernard Bosanquet’s The Essentials of Logic and C.E.M. Joad’s Teach Yourself Philosophy.  Logic, as a branch of philosophy attracted Wiredu because of its affinities to grammar, which he enjoyed.  He was also fond of practical psychology during the formative years of his life.  In 1950, whilst vacationing with his aunt in Accra, the capital of Ghana, he came across another philosophical text which influenced him tremendously.  The text was The Last Days of Socrates which had the following four dialogues by Plato: The Apology, Euthyphro, Meno and Crito. These dialogues were to influence, in a significant way, the final chapter of his first groundbreaking philosophical text, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) which is also dialogic in structure.

He was admitted into the University of Ghana, Legon in 1952, to read philosophy, but before attending he started to study the thought of John Dewey on his own. However, mention must be made of the fact that C. E. M. Joad’s philosophy had a particularly powerful effect on him. Indeed, he employed the name J. E. Joad as his pen-name for a series of political articles he wrote for a national newspaper, The Ashanti Sentinel between 1950 and1951.  At the University of Ghana, he was instructed mainly in Western philosophy and he came to find out about African traditions of thought more or less through his own individual efforts.  He was later to admit that the character of his undergraduate education was to leave his mind a virtual tabula rasa, as far as African philosophy was concerned.  In other words, he had to develop and maintain his interests in African philosophy on his own. One of the first texts of African philosophy that he read was J. B. Danquah’s Akan Doctrine of God: A Fragment of Gold Coast Ethics and Religion.  Undoubtedly, his best friend William Abraham, who went a year before him to Oxford University, must have also influenced the direction of his philosophical research towards African thought.  A passage from an interview explains the issue of his institutional relation to African philosophy:

Prior to 1985, when I was in Africa, I devoted most of my time in almost equal proportions to research in African philosophy and in other areas of philosophy, such as the philosophy of logic, in which not much has, or is generally known to have, been done in African philosophy.  I did not have always to be teaching African philosophy or giving public lectures in African philosophy. There were others who were also competent to teach the subject and give talks in our Department of Philosophy.  But since I came to the United States, I have often been called upon to teach or talk about African philosophy.  I have therefore spent much more time than before researching in that area. This does not mean that I have altogether ignored my earlier interests, for indeed, I continue to teach subjects like (Western) logic and epistemology (Wiredu in Oladiop 2002: 332).

Wiredu began publishing relatively late, but has been exceedingly prolific ever since he started. During the early to mid 1970s, he often published as many as six major papers per year on topics ranging from logic, to epistemology, to African systems of thought, in reputable international journals.  His first major book, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) is truly remarkable for its eclectic range of interests.  Paulin Hountondji, Wiredu’s great contemporary from the Republic of Benin, for many years had to deal with charges that his philosophically impressive corpus lacked ideological content and therefore merit from critics such as Olabiyi Yai (1977).  Hountondji (1983; 2002) in those times of extreme ideologizing, never avoided the required measure of socialist posturing.  Wiredu, on the other hand, not only avoided the lure of socialism but went on to denounce it as an unfit ideology.  Within the context of the socio-political moment of that era, it seemed a reactionary—even injurious—posture to adopt.  Nonetheless, he had not only laid the foundations of his project of conceptual decolonization at the theoretical level but had also begun to explore its various practical implications by his analyses of concepts such as “truth,” and also by his focused critique of some of the more counter-productive impacts of both colonialism and traditional culture.

By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two objectives.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavoury aspects of indigenous traditions embedded in modern African thought so as to make it more viable.  Second, he intends to undermine the unhelpful Western epistemologies to be found in African philosophical traditions. On this important formulation of his he states:

By this I mean the purging of African philosophical thinking of all uncritical assimilation of Western ways of thinking. That, of course, would be only part of the battle won. The other desiderata are the careful study of our own traditional philosophies and the synthesising of any insights obtained from that source with any other insights that might be gained from the intellectual resources of the modern world.  In my opinion, it is only by such a reflective integration of the traditional and the modern that contemporary African philosophers can contribute to the flourishing of our peoples and, ultimately, all other peoples. (Oladipo, 2002: 328)

In spite of his invaluable contributions to modern African thought, it can be argued that Wiredu’s schema falls short as a feasible long term epistemic project.  Due to the hybridity of the postcolonial condition, projects seeking to retrieve the precolonial heritage are bound to be marred at several levels.  It would be an error for Wiredu or advocates of his project of conceptual decolonization to attempt to universalize his theory since, as Ngugi wa Thiongo argues, decolonization is a vast, global enterprise.  Rather, it is safer to read Wiredu’s project as a way of articulating theoretical presence for the de-agentialized and deterritorialized contemporary African subject.  In many ways, his project resembles those of Ngugi wa Thiongo and Cheikh Anta Diop.  Ngugi wa Thiongo advocates cultural and linguistic decolonization on a global scale and his theory has undergone very little transformation since its formulation in the 1960s.  Diop advances a similar set of ideas to Wiredu on the subject of vibrant modern African identities. Wiredu’s project is linked in conceptual terms to the broader project of political decolonization as advanced by liberationist African leaders such as Julius Nyerere, Jomo Kenyatta, Kwame Nkrumah, and Nnamdi Azikiwe.  But what distinguishes the particular complexion of his theory is its links with the Anglo-Saxon analytic tradition. This dimension is important in differentiating his project from those of his equally illustrious contemporaries such as V. Y. Mudimbe and Paulin Hountondji.  In fact, it can be argued that Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization has more similarities with Ngugi wa Thiongo’s ideas regarding African cultural and linguistic agency than Mudimbe’s archeological excavations of African traces in Western historical and anthropological texts.

3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice

In all previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topic of considerable academic interest.  Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization is essentially what defines his attitudes and gestures towards the content of contemporary African thought.  Also it is an insight that is inflected by years of immersion into British analytic philosophy.  Wiredu began his reflections of the nature, legitimate aims, and possible orientations in contemporary African thought not as a result of any particular awareness of the trauma or violence of colonialism or imperialism but by a confrontation with the dilemma of modernity by the reflective (post)colonial African consciousness.  This dialectic origin can be contrasted with those of his contemporaries such as Paulin Hountondji and V. Y. Mudimbe.

Despite criticisms regarding some aspects of his work, in terms of founding a tradition for the practice of modern African philosophy, Wiredu’s contributions have been pivotal. He has also been very consistent in his output and the quality of his reflections regardless of some of their more obvious limitations.

As noted earlier, Wiredu was trained in a particular tradition of Western philosophy: the analytic tradition.  This fact is reflected in his corpus.  A major charge held against him is that his contributions could be made even richer if he had grappled with other relevant discourses: postcolonial theory, African feminisms, contemporary Afrocentric discourses and the global dimensions of projects and discourses of decolonization.

Kwasi Wiredu’s interests and philosophical importance are certainly not limited to conceptual decolonization alone.  He has offered some useful insights on Marxism, mysticism, metaphysics, and the general nature of the philosophical enterprise itself. Although his latter text, Cultural Universals and Particulars has a more Africa-centred orientation, his first book, Philosophy and an African Culture presents a wider range of discursive interests: a vigorous critique of Marxism, reflections on the phenomenon of ideology, analyses of truth and the philosophy of language, among other preoccupations. It is interesting to see how Wiredu weaves together these different preoccupations and also to observe how some of them have endured while others have not.

The volume Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy is an apt summation of Wiredu’s philosophical interests with a decidedly African problematic while his landmark philosophical work, Philosophy and an African Culture, published first in 1980, should serve as a fertile source for more detailed elucidation.

In the second essay of Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy entitled “The Need for Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy”, Wiredu writes that “with an even greater sense of urgency the intervening decade does not seem to have brought any indications of a widespread realization of the need for conceptual decolonisation in African philosophy” (Wiredu, 1995: 23).  The intention at this juncture is to examine some of the ways in which Wiredu has been involved in the daunting task of conceptual decolonization.  Decolonization itself is a problematic exercise because it necessitates the jettisoning of certain conceptual attitudes that inform one’s worldviews.  Secondly, it usually entails an attempt at the retrieval of a more or less fragmented historical heritage.  Decolonization in Fanon’s conception entails this necessity for all colonized peoples and, in addition, it is “a programme of complete disorder” (Fanon, 1963:20).  This understanding is purely political and has therefore, a practical import.  This is not to say that Fanon had no plan for the project of decolonization in the intellectual sphere.  Also associated with this project as it was then conceived was a struggle for the mental liberation of the colonized African peoples.  It was indeed a program of violence in more senses than one.

However, with Wiredu, there isn’t an outright endorsement of violence, as decolonization in this instance amounts to conceptual subversion.  As a logical consequence, it is necessary to stress the difference between Fanon’s conception of decolonization and Wiredu’s.  Fanon is sometimes regarded as belonging to the same philosophical persuasion that harbours figures like Nkrumah, Senghor, Nyerere and Sekou Toure, “the philosopher-kings of early post-independence Africa” (Wiredu,1995:14), as Wiredu calls them.  This is so because they had to live out the various dramas of existence and the struggles for self and collective identity at more or less the same colonial/postcolonial moment.  Those “spiritual uncles” of professional African philosophers were engaged, as Wiredu states, in a strictly political struggle, and whatever philosophical insight they possessed was put at the disposal of this struggle, instead of a merely theoretical endeavour.  Obviously, Fanon was the most astute theoretician of decolonization of the lot.  In addition, for Fanon and the so-called philosopher-kings, decolonization was invested with a pan-African mandate and political appeal.  This crucial difference should be noted alongside what shall soon be demonstrated to be the Wiredu conception of decolonization.  Africans, generally, will have to continue to ponder the entire issue of decolonization as long as unsolved questions of identity remain and the challenges of collective development linger.  This type of challenge was foreseen by Fanon.

The end of colonialism in Africa and other Third World countries did not entail the end of imperialism and the dominance of the metropolitan countries.  Instead, the dynamics of dominance assumed a more complex, if subtle, form.  African economic systems floundered alongside African political institutions, and, as a result, various crises have compounded the seemingly perennial issue of underdevelopment.

A significant portion of post-colonial theory involves the entry of Third World scholars into the Western archive, as it were, with the intention of dislodging the erroneous epistemological assumptions and structures regarding their peoples.  This, arguably, is another variant of decolonization.  Wiredu partakes of this type of activity, but sometimes he carries the program even further.  Accordingly, he affirms:

Until Africa can have a lingua franca, we will have to communicate suitable parts of our work in our multifarious vernaculars, and in other forms of popular discourse, while using the metropolitan languages for international communication. (Wiredu, 1995:20)

This conviction has been a guiding principle with Wiredu for several years.  In fact, it is not merely a conviction; there are several instances within the broad spectrum of his philosophical corpus where he tries to put it into practice.  Two of such attempts are his essays “The Concept of Truth in the Akan Language” and “The Akan Concept of Mind.”  In the first of these articles, Wiredu states “there is no one word in Akan for truth” (Wiredu, 1985:46).  Similarly, he writes, “another linguistic contrast between Akan and English is that there is no word “fact” (Ibid.).  It is necessary to cite the central thesis of the essay; Wiredu writes that he wants “to make a metadoctrinal point which reflection on the African language enables us to see, which is that a theory of truth is not of any real universal significance unless it offers some account of the notion of being so” (Ibid.).

Wiredu’s argument here, needs to be firmer.  In many respects, he is only comparing component parts of the English language with the Akan language and not always with a view to drawing out “any real universal significance” as he says.  The entire approach seems to be irrevocably restrictive.  This is the distinction that lies between an oral culture and a textual one.  Most African intellectuals usually gloss over this difference, even though they may acknowledge it.  The difference is indeed very significant, because of the numerous imponderables that come into play.  Abiola Irele has been able to demonstrate the tremendous significance of orality in the constitution of modern African forms of literary expression.

However, Wiredu is more convincing in his essay “Democracy and Consensus in African Traditional Politics: A Plea for a Non-Party Polity”.  In this essay, Wiredu argues that the:

Ashanti system was a consensual democracy. It was a democracy because government was by the consent, and subject to the control, of the people as expressed through the representatives. It was consensual because, at least, as a rule, that consent was negotiated on the principle of consensus. (By contrast, the majoritarian system might be said to be, in principle, based on consent without consensus.) (Ibid. pp58-59)

When Wiredu broaches the issue of politics and its present and future contexts in postcolonial Africa, then we are compelled to visit a whole range of debates and discourses especially in the social sciences in Africa.  These arearguably more directly concerned with questions pertaining to governance, democracy, and the challenges of contemporary globalization.

Another essay by Wiredu, entitled “The Akan Concept of Mind” is also an attempt of conceptual recontextualization.  Wiredu begins by stating that he is restricting himself to a study of the Akans of Ghana in order “to keep the discussion within reasonable anthropological bounds” (Wiredu, 1983:113).  His objective is a modest but nevertheless important one, since it fits quite well with his entire philosophical project which, as noted, is concerned with ironing out philosophical issues “on independent grounds” and possibly in one’s own language and the metropolitan language bequeathed by the colonial heritage.

It is therefore appropriate to proceed gradually, traversing the problematic interfaces between various languages in search of satisfactory structures of meaning.  The immediate effect is a radical diminishing of the entire concept of African philosophy, a term which under these circumstances would become even more problematic.  The consequence of Wiredu’s position is that to arrive at the essence of African philosophy, it would be necessary to dismantle its monolithic structure to make it more context-bound.  First, Africa as a spatial entity would require further re-drawing of its often problematic geography.  Second, a new thematics to mediate between the general and the particular would have to be found.  Third, the critique of unanimism and ethnophilosophy would be driven into more contested terrains.  These are some of the likely challenges posed by Wiredu’s approach.

Furthermore, in dealing with the traditional Akan conceptual system, or any other, for that matter, it should be borne in mind that what is in contention is “a folk philosophy, a body of originally unwritten ideas preserved in the oral traditions, customs and usages of a people” (Ibid.).

It would be appropriate to examine more closely his article “The Akan Concept of Mind”.  Here, Wiredu enumerates the ways in which the English conception of mind differs markedly from that of the Akan, due in a large part to certain fundamental linguistic dissimilarities.  He also makes the point that “the Akans most certainly do not regard mind as one of the entities that go to constitute a person” (Ibid. 121).  It is significant to note this, but at the same time, it is difficult to imagine the ultimate viability of this approach.  Indeed after reformulating traditional Western philosophical problems to suit African conditions, it remains to be seen how African epistemological claims can be substantiated using the natural and logical procedures available to African systems of thought.  As such, it is possible to argue that this conceptual manoeuvre would eventually degenerate into a dead-end of epistemic nativism.  These are the kinds of issues raised by Wiredu’s project.

As such, inherent in the thrust for complete decolonization is the presence of colonial violence itself.  In addition, there is essentially a latent desire for epistemic violence, as well as difficulties concerning the negotiation of linguistic divides. In the following quotation, for example, Wiredu attempts to demonstrate the significance of some of those differences:

By comparison with the conflation of concepts of mind and soul prevalent in Western philosophy, the Akan separation of the “Okra” from “adwene” suggests a more analytical awareness of the sanctification of human personality. (Ibid.128)

It is necessary to substantiate more rigorously claims such as this because we may also be committing an error in establishing certain troublesome linguistic or philosophical correspondences between two disparate cultures and traditions.

Another crucial, if distressing, feature of decolonization as advanced by Wiredu is that it always has to measure itself up with the colonizing Other, that is, it finds it almost impossible to create its own image so to speak by the employment of autochthonous strategies.  This is not to assert that decolonization always has to avail itself of indigenous procedures, but the very concept of decolonization is in fact concerned with breaking away from imperial structures of dominance in order to express a will to self-identity or presence.  To be sure, the Other is always present, defacing all claims to full presence of the decolonizing subject.  This is a contradictory but inevitable trope within the postcolonial condition.  The Other is always there to present the criteria by which self-identity is adjudged either favourably or unfavourably. There is no getting around the Other as it is introduced in its own latent and covert violence, in the hesitant counter-violence of the decolonizing subject and invariably in the counter-articulations of all projects of decolonization.

4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development

Wiredu’s later attempts at conceptual decolonization have been quite interesting.  An example of such an attempt is the essay “Custom and Morality: A Comparative Analysis of some African and Western Conceptions of Morals.”  He is able to explore at greater length some of the conceptual confusions that arise as a result of the transplantation of Western ideas within an African frame of reference.  This wholesale transference of foreign ideas and conceptual models has caused the occurrence of severe cases of identity crises and, to borrow a more apposite term, colonial mentality.  Indeed, one of the aims of Wiredu’s efforts at conceptual decolonization is to indicate instances of colonial mentality and determine strategies by which they can be minimized.  Accordingly he is quite convincing when he argues that polygamy in a traditional setting amounts to efficient social thinking but is most inappropriate within a modern framework.  In this way, Wiredu is offering a critique of a certain traditional practice that ought to be discarded on account of the demands and realities of a modern economy.

On another level, it appears that Wiredu has not sufficiently interrogated the distance between orality and textuality.  If indeed he has done so, he would be rather more skeptical about the manner in which he thinks he can dislodge certain Western philosophical structures embedded in the African consciousness.

Wiredu has always believed that traditional modes of thought and folk philosophies should be interpreted, clarified, analyzed and subjected to critical evaluation and assimilation (Wiredu, 1980: x).  Also, at the beginning of his philosophical reflections, he puts forth the crucial formulation that there is no reason why the African philosopher “in his philosophical meditations […] should not test formulations in those against intuitions in his own language” (Wiredu, 1980: xi).  And, rather than merely discussing the possibilities for evolving modern traditions in African philosophy, African philosophers should actually begin to do so (Hountondji, 1983).  In carrying out this task, the African philosopher has a few available methodological approaches.  First, he is urged to “acquaint himself with the different philosophies of the different cultures of the world, not to be encylopaedic or eclectic, but with the aim of trying to see how far issues and concepts of universal relevance can be disentangled from the contingencies of culture” (Wiredu, 1980: 31).  He also adds that “the African philosopher has no choice but to conduct his philosophical inquiries in relation to the philosophical writings of other peoples, for his ancestors left him no heritage of philosophical writings” (Wiredu, 1980: 48).  For Wiredu, the use of translations is a fundamental aspect of contemporary African philosophical practices.  However, on the dilemmas of translation in the current age of neoliberalism, it has been noted: “translations are [..] put ‘out of joint.’  However correct or legitimate they may be, and whatever right one may acknowledge them to have, they are all disadjusted, as it were unjust in the gap that affects them.  This gap is within them, to be sure, because their meanings remain necessarily equivocal; next it is in the relation among them and thus their multiplicity, and finally or first of all in the irreducible inadequation to the other language and to the stroke of genius of the event that makes the law, to all the virtualities of the original” (Derrida, 1994:19).  Wiredu does not contemplate the implications of this kind of indictment in his formulations of an approach to African philosophy.  Perhaps the task at hand is simply too important and demanding to cater to such philosophical niceties.  In relation to the kind of philosophical heritage at the disposal of the African philosopher, Wiredu identifies three main strands; “a folk philosophy, a written traditional philosophy and a modern philosophy” (Wiredu, 1980:46).  Wiredu’s approach to questions of this sort is embedded in his general theoretical stance: “It is a function, indeed a duty, of philosophy in any society to examine the intellectual foundations of its culture.  For any such examination to be of any real use, it should take the form of reasoned criticism and, where possible, reconstruction. No other way to philosophical progress is known than through criticism and adaptation” (Wiredu, 1980: 20).

The drive to attain progress is not limited to philosophical discourse alone.  Entire communities and cultures usually aim to improve upon their institutions and practices in order to remain relevant.  Societies can lose the momentum of growth and “various habits of thought and practice can become anachronistic within the context of the development of a given society; but an entire society too can become anachronistic within the context of the whole world if the ways of life within it are predominantly anachronistic.  In the latter case, of course, there is no discarding society; what you do is to modernize it” (Wiredu, 1980:1).  The theme of modernization occurs frequently in Wiredu’s corpus.  He does not fully conceptualize it nor relate it to the various ideological histories it has encountered in the domains of social science, where it became a fully fledged discipline. Modernization, for him, is based on an uncomplicated pragmatism that owes much to Deweyan thought.

This kind of posture, that is, the consistent critique of the retrogression inherent in tradition and its proclivity for the fossilization of culture, is directed at Leopold Sedar Senghor.  On Senghor, he writes, “it is almost as if he has been trying to exemplify in his own thought and discourse the lack of the analytical habit which he has attributed to the biology of the African.  Most seriously of all, Senghor has celebrated the fact our (traditional) mind is of a non-analytical bent; which is very unfortunate, seeing that this mental attribute is more of a limitation than anything else” (Wiredu, 1980:12).  Wiredu’s main criticism of Senghor is one that is always leveled against the latter.  Apart from that charge that Senghor essentializes the concept and ideologies of blackness, he is also charged with defeatism that undermines struggles for liberation and decolonization.  However, Paul Gilroy has unearthed a more sympathetic context in which to read and situate Senghorian thought.  In Gilroy’s reading, an acceptable ideology of blackness emerges from Senghor’s work. And in this way, Wiredu’s critique loses some of its originality.

Senghor is cast as a traditionalist and tradition itself is the subject of a much broader critique.  On some of the drawbacks of tradition Wiredu writes,

it is as true in Africa as anywhere else that logical, mathematical, analytical, experimental procedures are essential in the quest for the knowledge of, and control over, nature and therefore, in any endeavour to improve the condition of man. Our traditional culture was somewhat wanting in this respect and this is largely responsible for the weaknesses of traditional technology, warfare, architecture, medicine….” (Wiredu, 1980: 12) (italics mine)

Sometimes, Wiredu carries his critique of tradition too far as when he advances the view that “traditional medicine is terribly weak in diagnosis and weaker still in pharmacology” (Wiredu, 1980: 12).  In recent times, a major part of Hountondji’s project is to demonstrate that traditional knowledges are not only useful and viable but also the necessity to situate them in appropriate modern contexts.  Hountondji’s latest gesture is curious since both he and Wiredu are supposed to belong to the same philosophic tendency as described by Bodunrin under the rubric of West-led universalism.  However, Wiredu’s attack on tradition is vitiated by his project of conceptual decolonization which, in order to work, requires the recuperation of vital elements in traditional culture.

Wiredu’s stance in relation to modernization and tradition gets refined by his condemnation of some aspects of urban existence which exhibit a manifestation of postmodern environmentalism. First, he writes, “it is quite clear to me that unrestricted industrial urbanization is contrary to any humane culture; it is certainly contrary to our own” (Wiredu, 1980:22). Also, “one of the powerful strains on our extended family system is the very extensive poverty which oppresses out rural populations. Owing to this, people working in the towns and cities are constantly burdened with the financial needs of rural relatives which they usually cannot entirely satisfy”(Wiredu, 1980:22). Contemporary anthropological studies dealing with Africa have dwelt extensively on this phenomenon. The point is, in Africa, forms of sociality exists that can no longer be found in the North Atlantic civilization. If this civilization (the North Atlantic) is characterized by extreme individualism, African forms of social existence on the other hand tend towards the gregarious in which conceptions of generosity, corruption, gratitude, philanthropy, ethnicity  and even justice take on different slightly forms from what obtains within the vastly different North Atlantic context.

Also problematic is Wiredu’s reading of colonialism which is very similar to those of authors such as Ngugi wa Thiongo, Walter Rodney or even Chinua Achebe. In this reading, the colonized is abused, brutalized, silenced and reconstructed against her/his own will.  Colonialism causes the destruction of agency. On de-agentialization, Wiredu states, “any human arrangement is authoritarian if it entails any person being made to do or suffer something against his will, or if it leads to any person being hindered in the development of his own will” (Wiredu, 1980:2).  Homi Bhabha advances the notion of ambivalence to highlight the cultural reciprocities inherent in the entire colonial encounter and structure. This kind of reading of the colonial event has led to a rethinking of colonial theory. But Wiredu’s reading of the colonial encounter is infected by the radical persuasion of early African theorists of decolonization: “The period of colonial struggle was […] a period of cultural affirmation. It was necessary to restore in ourselves our previous confidence which had been so seriously eroded by colonialism. We are still, admittedly, even in post-colonial times, in an era of cultural self-affirmation” (Ibid.59).

5. An African Reading of Karl Marx

Marxist theory and discourse generally provided many African intellectuals with a platform on which to conduct many sociopolitical struggles. In fact, for many African scholars, it served as the only ideological tool. But not all scholars found Marxism acceptable. Wiredu was one of the scholars who has deep reservations about it. But he is not in doubt about the philosophical significance of Marx: “I regard Karl Marx as one of the great philosophers” (Wiredu, 1980:63). Derrida is even more forthcoming on the depth of this significance: “It will always be a fault not to read and reread and discuss Marx- which is to say also a few others- and to go beyond scholarly “reading” or “discussion.” It will be more and more a fault, a failing of theoretical, philosophical, political responsibility” (Derrida, 1994:13). Again, he writes, “the Marxist inheritance was- and still remains, and so it will remain- absolutely and thoroughly determinate. One need not be a Marxist or a communist in order to accept this obvious fact. We all live in a world, some would say a culture, that bears, at an incalculable depth, the mark of this inheritance, whether in a directly visible fashion or not”(Ibid.).

Marxism during era of the Cold War was the major ideological issue and in the present age of neoliberalism it continues to haunt (Derrida’s precise phrase is hauntology) us with its multiple legacies. Wiredu’s critique of Marx and Engels is located within the epoch of the Cold War. But from it, we get a glimpse of not only his political orientation but also his philosophical predilections. For instance, at a point, he claims “the food one eats, the hairstyle one adopts, the amount of money one has, the power one wields- all these and such circumstances are irrelevant from an epistemological point of view” (Wiredu, 1980:66). But Foucault-style analyses have demonstrated that these seemingly marginal activities have a tremendous impact on knowledge/power configurations that are often difficult to ignore. Michel de Certeau has demonstrated these so-called inconsequential acts become significant as gestures of resistance for the benefit of the weak and politically powerless. In his words, “the weak must continually turn to their own ends forces alien to them” (de Certeau 1984: xix). On those specific acts of the weak, he writes, “many everyday practices (talking, reading, moving about, shopping, cooking, etc.) are tactical in character. And so are, more generally, many “ways of operating”: victories of the “weak” over the “strong” (whether the strength be that of powerful people or the violence of things or of an imposed order, etc.), clever tricks, knowing how to get away with things, “hunter’s cunning,” maneuvers, polymorphic simulations, joyful discoveries, poetic  as well as warlike. The Greeks called these “ways of operating” metis (Ibid.). This reading gives an entirely different perspective on acts and themes of resistance as panoptical surveillance in the age of global neoliberalism becomes more totalitarian in nature at specific moments.

As a philosopher versed in analytic philosophy, truth is a primary concern of Wiredu and this concern is incorporated into his analysis of Marxist philosophy. Hence, he identifies the following points, “the cognition of truth is recognized by Engels as the business of philosophy; (2) What is denied is absolute truth, not truth as such; (3) The belief, so finely expressed, in the progressive character of truth; (4) Engels speaks of this process of cognition as the ‘development of science.’ (5) That a consciousness of limitation is a necessary element in all acquired knowledge” (Wiredu,1980:64-65). Wiredu explains that these various Marxian assertions on truth are no different from those of the logician, C. S. Peirce who had expounded them under a formulation he called “fallibilism.” John Dewey also expounded them under the concept of ‘pragmatism’(Ibid.67). So the point here is that some of the main Marxist propositions on truth have parallels in analytic philosophy. Nonetheless, this raises an unsettling question about Marxism and its relation to truth: “How is it that a philosophy which advocates such an admirable doctrine as the humanistic conception of truth tends so often to lead in practice to the suppression of freedom of thought and expression? Is it by accident that this comes to be so? Or is it due to causes internal to the philosophy of Marx and Engels”(Ibid.68). Wiredu demonstrates strong reservations about what Ernest Wamba dia Wamba calls ‘bureaucratic socialism.” Derrida on his part, urges us to distinguish between Marx as a philosopher and the innumerable specters of Marx. In other words, there is a difference between “the dogma machine and the “Marxist” ideological apparatuses (States, parties, cells, unions, and other places of doctrinal production)”(Derrida,1994:13)  and the necessity to treat Marx as a great philosopher. We need to “try to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of classified work” (Ibid.31).  We also need to remember that “he doesn’t belong to the communists, to the Marxists, to the parties, he ought to figure within our great canon of […] political philosophy” (Ibid.31).

Wiredu’s reading of Marxism generally is quite damaging. First, he states, “Engels himself, never perfectly consistent, already compromises his conception of truth with some concessions to absolute truth in Anti-Duhring” (Wiredu, 1980:68). He then makes an even more damaging accusation that a form of authoritarianism lies at the heart of conception of philosophy propagated by Marx and Engels.  On what he considers to a deep-seated confusion in their work, he writes, “Engels recognizes the cognition of truth to be a legitimate business of philosophy and makes a number of excellent points about truth. As soon, however, as one tries to find out what he and Marx conceived philosophy to be like, one is faced with a deep obscurity. The problem resolves round what one may describe as Marx’s conception of philosophy as ideology” (Ibid.70). Here, Wiredu makes the crucial distinction between Marx as a philosopher and the effects of his numerous spectralities and for this reason he offers his most important criticism of his general critique of Marxism. He also accuses Marx of instances of “carelessness in the use of cardinal terms” which he says “may be symptomatic of deep inadequacies of thought”(Ibid.74). This charge, which relates to Marx’s conception of consciousness is indeed serious since it borders on the question of conceptual clarification as advanced by the canon of analytic philosophy. Wiredu argues that Marx and Engels are unclear about their employment of the concept of ideology: “Marx and Engels are […] on the horns of a dilemma. If all philosophical thinking is ideological, then their thinking is ideological and, by their hypothesis, false”(Ibid.76). Wiredu’s insights are very important here: “He and Engels simply assumed for themselves the privilege of exempting their own philosophizing from the ideological theory of ideas”(Ibid.77). Consequently, Marx commits a grave error “in his conception of ideology and its bearing upon philosophy”(Ibid.81).

Another area Wiredu finds Marx and Engels wanting is moral philosophy. In other words, Marx “confused moral philosophy with moralism and assumed rather than argued a moral standpoint”(Ibid.79). Furthermore, he had precious little to say on the nature of the relationship between philosophy and morality. Engels does better on this score as there is a treatment of morality in Anti-Duhring. Nonetheless, Engels is charged with giving “no guidance on the conceptual problems that have perplexed moral philosophers” (Ibi.80). Henceforth, Wiredu becomes increasing dismissive of Marx, Marxism and its followers. First, he writes, “the run-of the-mill Marxists, even less enamoured of philosophical accuracy than their masters, have made the ideological conception of philosophy a battle cry”(Ibid.80). And then he singles out ‘scientific socialism’ which he regards as being unclear in its elaboration and which he typifies as “an amalgam of factual and evaluative elements blended together without regard to categorical stratification”(Ibid.85). In one of his most damaging assessments of Marxism, he declares: “Ideology is the death of philosophy. To the extent to which Marxism, by its own internal incoherences, tends to be transformed into an ideology, to that extent Marxism is a science of the unscientific and a philosophy of the unphilosophic” (Ibid.87).

In sum, Wiredu general attitude towards Marxism is one of condemnation. However, in the contemporary re-evaluations of Marxism a few discursive elements need to be clarified; the inclusion of the demarcation of Cold War and post Cold War assessments of Marxism ought to be employed as an analytical yardstick and also the necessity to sift through the various specters and legacies of Marx as distinct from those of Marxism. This is the kind of reading that Derrida urges us to do and it is also one to which we shall now turn our attention.

Derrida states it is imperative to distinguish between the legacies of Marx and the various spectralities of Marxism. In addition to this distinction we might add another crucial one: analyses of Marxism before and after the fall of the former Soviet Union. Wiredu’s critique is based on the pre-Soviet debacle whilst Derrida’s draws some of his reflections based on the post-Soviet fall. In these two different critiques, we must be careful to always strive to isolate the theoretical elements and insights that bypass short-lived discursive trends and political interests which often tend to vitiate the more profound effects of the works of Karl Marx and those that do not.

The debacle of the former Soviet Union and the apparent hegemony of neoliberal ideology have generated discourses associated with the “ends” of discourse. But Derrida points out that there is nothing new in the contemporary proclamations affirming the end of discourses which are in fact anachronistic when compared to the earlier versions of the same discursive orientation that emerged in the 1950s and which in a vital sense owed a great deal to a certain spirit of Marx: “the eschatological themes of the “end of history,” of the “end of Marxism,” of the “end of philosophy,” of the “ends of man,” of the “last man” and so forth were, in the ‘50s, that is, forty years ago our daily bread. We had this bread of apocalypse in our mouths naturally, already, just as naturally as that which I nicknamed after the fact, in 1980, the “apocalyptic tone in philosophy” (Derrida, 1994:14-15). In a way, in fact the contemporary discourses of endism that draw from the spirit of neoliberal triumphalism, without acknowledging it, are greatly indebted to Marxism and the more constructive critiques of it. Deconstruction, in part, emerged from the necessity to critique the various forms of statist Stalinism, the numerous socio-economic failings of Soviet bureaucracy and the political repression in Hungary. In other words, it emerged partly from the need to organize critiques for degraded forms of socialism.

In speaking about the inheritance of Marx, Derrida also reflects on the injunction associated with it. The task of reflecting on this inheritance and the injunction to which it gives rise is demanding: … “one must filter, sift, criticize, one must sort out several different possibles that inhabit the same injunction. And inhabit it in a contradictory fashion around a secret. If the readability of a legacy were given, natural, transparent, univocal, if it did not call for and at the same time defy interpretation, we would never have anything to inherit from it” (Ibid.16). Derrida’s employment of terms and phrases such “inheritance,” “injunction,” and the “spectrality of the specter” in relation to the legacies of Marx has to do with the question of the genius of Marx: “Whether evil or not, a genius operates, it always resists and defies after the fashion of a spectral thing. The animated work becomes that thing, the Thing that, like an elusive specter, engineers [s’ingenie] a habitation without proper inhabiting, call it is a haunting, of both memory and translation” (Ibid.18).

A work of genius, a masterpiece in addition to giving rise to spectralities also generates legions of imitators and followers. Of the Marxists who came after Marx, Wiredu writes; “I find that Marxists are especially prone to confuse factual with ideological issues. Undoubtedly, the great majority of those who call themselves Marxists do not share the ideology of Marx”(Wiredu,1980:94). In order to transcend the violence and confusion of Marxists who misread Marx, we need “to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of a classified work”(Derrida,1994:31). The work of re-reading Marx, of re-establishing his philosophical value and importance is a task needs to be performed in universities, conferences, colloquia and also in less academic sites and fora.

Within the contemporary cultural moment, new configurations have arisen that were not present during Marx’s day. Indeed, “a set of transformations of all sorts (in particular, techno-scientific-economic-media) exceeds both the traditional givens of the Marxist discourse and those of the liberal discourse opposed to it”(Ibid.70). Also,

Electoral representativity or parliamentary life is not only distorted, as was always the case, by a great number of socio-economic mechanisms, but it is exercised with more and more difficulty in a public space profoundly upset by techno-tele-media apparatuses and by new rhythms of information and communication, by the devices and the speed of forces represented by the latter, but also and consequently by the new modes of appropriation they put to work, by the new structure of the event and of its spectrality that they produce.” (Ibid.79)

Here, the instructive point is that the new information technologies have radically transformed the possibilities of the event and the modes of its production, reception and also interpretation. But there is a far more radical change that has occurred and which signals a profound crisis of global capitalism and the neoliberal ideology that underpins it: “For what must be cried out, at a time when some have the audacity to neo-evangelize in the name of the ideal of liberal democracy that has finally realized itself  as the ideal of human history: never have violence, inequality, exclusion, famine, and thus economic oppression affected as many human beings in the history of the earth and of humanity”(Ibid.85). Also, “never have so many men, women, and children been subjugated, starved, or exterminated on the earth.” (Ibid.)

So Derrida identifies a few new factors that need to be included in the critique of Marxism in the contemporary moment namely the phenomenon of spectralization caused by techno-science and digitalization, the weakening of the practice of liberal democracy and also the crises and multiple contradictions inherent in global capitalism. It is necessary to include another element into the present configuration which is the rise of political Islam as an alternative ideology, its subsequent fervent politicization and its Western reconstruction into an ideology of terror.

Wiredu’s reading of Marx focuses on the conceptual infelicities in the latter’s theorizations of notions such as “ideology,” “consciousness,” and “truth.” Wiredu also criticizes Marx’s project of moral philosophy or in fact the lack of it. On the whole, his reading isn’t complementary. Indeed, it amounts to a dismissal of Marx in spite of the attempt to read him without the obfuscations of innumerable legacies.

6. Conclusion

Arguably, Wiredu’s particular contribution to the debate on the origins, status, problematic and future of contemporary African philosophy resides in his formulations regarding his theory of conceptual decolonization. His approach in formulating this theory of discursive agency and more specifically philosophical practice involves the incorporation of a form bi-culturalism. In other words, his approach entails analyses of the canon of Western philosophy and also the manifestations of tribal cultures as a way of attaining a conceptual synthesis. Indeed, this schema involves a forceful element of bi-culturalism as a matter of logical consequence as well as a high level of [multi] bi-lingual competence. As such, it not only an exercise in conceptual synthesis but it is also a project involving comparative linguistics.

In Anglophone parts of Africa, Wiredu’s experience and research in teaching African philosophy has had a tremendous significance. The positive aspect of this is that the study of African philosophical thought has in positive moments transcended the problematic of identity or what has been termed as the problematic of origins. The less complimentary dimension of this equation is that Wiredu’s discoveries have given rise to (most undoubtedly unwittingly) a somewhat hegemonic school of disciples that is fostering a delimiting academicism and which is contrary to his essential spirit of conceptual inventiveness. As such, it might become necessary not only to critique Wiredu’s corpus but perhaps also Wiredu’s school of disciples which rather than appreciate the originality of his formulations fall instead for the pitfalls of over-ideologization.

Undoubtedly, Wiredu discovered a challenging path in modern African thought in which he sometimes takes the meaning of the existence of African philosophy for granted. In addition, it has been observed that also lacking at some moments in his oeuvre is an attempt to de-totalize and hence particularize the components of what he regards of the foundations of African philosophy.  In other words, African philosophy finds its form, shape and also its conceptual moorings above the discursive platform provided by Western philosophy. In addition, the theoretical space made available for its articulation is derived from the same Western-donated pool of unanimism. Part of recent interrogations of Wiredu’s work includes a questioning of the legitimacy of that space as the only site on which to construct an entire philosophical practice for the alienated, hybrid African consciousness. Oftentimes the question is posed, what are the ways by which the space can be broadened?

Indeed, terms such as reflective integration and due reflection offer the critical spaces for the theoretical articulation of something whose existence has not yet been concretely conceived. So in Wiredu’s corpus we see the very familiar problematic involving the tradition/modernity dichotomy being played out. Finally, it can be argued that this tension is not quite resolved but fortunately it is also a tension that never jeopardizes his philosophical inventiveness. Rather, it seems to animate his reflections in unprecedented ways.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Cronon, D. E. 1955. Black Moses: The Story of Marcus Garvey and the Universal Negro Improvement Association, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cummings, Robert. 1986. “Africa between the Ages” in African Studies Review, Vol. 29, No. 3, September.
  • Diop, Cheikh, Anta, 1974. The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality? Trans. M. Cook, Westport, Conn.: Lawrence Hill.
  • Doortmont, Michel R. 2005 The Pen-Pictures of Modern Africans and African Celebrities by Charles Francis Hutchison,  Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dubow, Saul. 2000 The African National Congress, Johannesburg: Jonathan Ball.
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1994. Specters of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, & the new international, trans. Peggy Kamuf, New York: Routledge.
  • Gates Jr., H. L. 1992. Loose Canons, New York: OxfordUniversity Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1967 Black Skin, White Masks (trans. C. Van Markmann) New York: Grove Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1963 The Wretched of the Earth, London: Penguin.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1974 The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1977 Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans A. M. Sheridan-Smith. London: Allen Lane.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1980 Language, Counter-Memory and Practice. Selected Essays and Interviews. Ed. Donald Bouchard, Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1982 The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1991 “Governmentality” in G. Burchell, C. Gordon and P. Miller, eds, The Foucault Effect.Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. 1983 African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, London: Hutchinson and Co.
  • Hountondji, Paulin.  2002 The Struggle for Meaning: Reflections on Philosophy, Culture and Democracy in Africa, Athens: Ohio University Center for International Studies.
  • Masolo, D.A. 1994 African Philosophy in Search of Identity Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1988 The Invention of Africa Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1994. The Idea of Africa,Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Oladipo,  Olusegun. ed. 2002  The Third Way in African Philosophy:Essays in Honour of Kwasi WireduIbadan: Hope Publications Ltd.
  • Osha, Sanya, 2005 Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa, Dakar: Codesria.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1976 Myth, Literature and the African World Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole,   1988 Art, Dialogue and Outrage Ibadan: New Horn Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1996 The Open Sore of a Continent New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole.  1999 The Burden of Memory, The Muse of Forgiveness New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole. 2000 “Memory, Truth and Healing” in The Politics of Memory, Truth, Healing and Social Justice, eds. I. Amaduime and A. An-Na’im, London: Zed Books
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1972 HomecomingLondon, Ibadan, Lusaka: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1981 Writers in PoliticsNairobi: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1986 Decolonising the MindNairobi: E.A.E.P.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1993 Moving the CentreLondon: James Currey.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Philosophy and an African CultureCambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1980.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1983 “The Akan Concept of Mind” in Ibadan Journal of Humanistic Studies, No. 3.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1985 “The Concept of Truth in Akan Language” in P.O. Bodunrin ed. Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Ile-Ife: University of Ife Press.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. and Gyekye, Kwame. 1992 Persons and Community. Washington, D.C.: The Council for Research in Values and Philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1993 “Canons of Conceptualisation” in The Monist: An International Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry Vol. 76, No. 4 October.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1995 Conceptual Decolonization in African PhilosophyIbadan: Hope Publications.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1996 Cultural Universals and ParticularsBloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Yai, Olabiyi. 1977 “The Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy,” Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.VI, No.2.


Author Information

Sanya Osha
Tshwane University of Technology
South Africa



Cultural diversity has been present in societies for a very long time. In Ancient Greece, there were various small regions with different costumes, traditions, dialects and identities, for example, those from Aetolia, Locris, Doris and Epirus. In the Ottoman Empire, Muslims were the majority, but there were also Christians, Jews, pagan Arabs, and other religious groups. In the 21st century, societies remain culturally diverse, with most countries having a mixture of individuals from different races, linguistic backgrounds, religious affiliations, and so forth. Contemporary political theorists have labeled this phenomenon of the coexistence of different cultures in the same geographical space multiculturalism. That is, one of the meanings of multiculturalism is the coexistence of different cultures.

The term ‘multiculturalism’, however, has not been used only to describe a culturally diverse society, but also to refer to a kind of policy that aims at protecting cultural diversity. Although multiculturalism is a phenomenon with a long history and there have been countries historically that did adopt multicultural policies, like the Ottoman Empire, the systematic study of multiculturalism in philosophy has only flourished in the late twentieth century, when it began to receive special attention, especially from liberal philosophers. The philosophers who initially dedicated more time to the topic were mainly Canadian, but in the 21st century it is a widespread topic in contemporary political philosophy. Before multiculturalism became a topic in political philosophy, most literature in this area focused on topics related to the fair redistribution of resources; conversely, the topic of multiculturalism in the realm of political philosophy highlights the idea that cultural identities are also normatively relevant and that policies ought to take these identities into consideration.

To understand the discussion of multiculturalism in contemporary political philosophy, there are four key topics that should be taken into consideration; these are the meaning of the concept of ‘culture’, the meaning of the concept of ‘multiculturalism’, the debate about justice between cultural groups and the discussion regarding the practical implications of multicultural practices.

Table of Contents

  1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory
    1. The Semiotic Perspective
    2. The Normative Conception
    3. The Societal Conception
    4. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach
    5. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism
  2. The Concept of Multiculturalism
    1. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society
    2. Multiculturalism as a Policy
      1. Multicultural Citizenship
        1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition
        2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism
        3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation
      2. Negative Universalism
        1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism
        2. Kukathas' Libertarianism
  3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism
    1. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals
    2. Women
    3. Children
  4. Animals and Multiculturalism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory

Multiculturalism is before anything else a theory about culture and its value. Hence, to understand what multiculturalism is it is indispensable that the meaning of culture is clarified. In this section, five concepts of culture that are predominant in contemporary political philosophy are outlined: semiotic, normative, societal, economic/rational choice and the anti-essentialist cosmopolitanism conceptions of culture. As Festenstein (2005) points out, these are not competing conceptions of culture, where each selects a distinct set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the right application of the predicate. Contrastingly, all these conceptions of culture defend, even though in slightly different ways, the idea that culture is constitutive of personal identity. Therefore, it is possible to simultaneously defend, say, a semiotic conception of culture and admit that a culture may have normative, societal, economic and cosmopolitan features.

a. The Semiotic Perspective

The semiotic conception of culture was very popular in the 1960s, and has its roots in classic social anthropology. Social anthropologists like Margaret Mead, Levi-Straus and Malinowski considered culture as a set of social systems, symbols, representations and practices of signification held by a certain group. Thus, from this perspective, a culture is defined as a system of ideals or structures of symbolic meaning. Put differently, according to this view, culture should be understood as a symbolic system which in turn is a way of communication which represents the world. This form of communication is based on symbols, underlying structures and beliefs or ideological principles. One of the philosophers endorsing this perspective of culture is Parekh (2005). According to Parekh (2005, p. 139), human life is organized by a historically created system of meaning and significance and in turn this is what we call culture.

Taylor (1994b) who contends that human beings are self-interpreting animals, that is, human beings’ identities depend on the way each individual sees them self, also endorses this viewpoint. These self-understandings necessarily have to have meaning. Hence, the thesis that human beings are self-interpreting animals presupposes that human existence is constituted by meaning. In turn, this implies that human beings are also language animals. By language, what is meant are all modes of expression (music, spoken language, art and so forth) (Taylor, 1994b). To be language animals means that individuals are capable of creating value and meaning, and in Taylor’s view, these meanings have their origins in each individual’s cultural community. That is to say, language is, at least primarily, a result of the interaction of individuals with their own cultural community (Taylor, 1974; 1994b). More precisely, linguistic meanings and self-interpretations have their origins in individuals’ linguistic communities. Thus, culture is a system of symbolic meaning.

Bearing this in mind, it can be argued that the study of culture from the semiotic perspective is the analysis or elucidation of meaning. As in hermeneutics, where the reader has to interpret the meaning of a text, in culture one has to interpret its internal logic (Festenstein, 2005). An example of interpreting the internal logic of a culture could be given by the story told by Quine (1960) regarding the native who says ‘Gavagai!’ whenever he sees a rabbit. Quine (1960) suggests that there may be multiple meanings associated with this actions; it may mean ‘rabbit’, ‘food’, ‘an undetached rabbit-part’, ‘there will be a storm tonight’ (if the native is superstitious) and so forth. The symbolism, sign process or system of meaning underlying this action is what, according to the point of view of semiotics, culture is, and this is what should be studied. In short, it is the study of culture’s autonomous logic.

b. The Normative Conception

The normative conception of culture is usually adopted by communitarians. From this point of view, culture is important because it is what provides beliefs, norms and moral reasons, prompting individuals to act. Hence, part of what a person is includes their moral commitments; their practical identity is made up of these moral commitments, while their reasons to act are motivated by their moral commitments. In other words, according to the normative conception of culture, the term ‘culture’ refers to a group of norms and beliefs that are distinctive and which constitute the practical identify of a group of individuals; thereby, people’s values and commitments result, in part, from culture (Festenstein, 2005, p. 14). By way of illustration, part of what a Christian, a Muslim and a Jew are is constituted by the fact they abide or follow the moral teachings of the Bible, the Quran and the Torah, respectively. Therefore, understanding who one is is about understanding one’s moral commitments and therefore culture is norm-providing. Shachar (2001a, p. 2) is one of the philosophers who endorses this conception of culture. According to her, culture is a world view, both comprehensive and distinguishable, whereby community law is able to be created. To minority groups that have a culture, Shachar (2001a, p.2) attaches the label ‘nomoi communities’. According to her, this term can apply to religious, ethnic, racial, tribal and national groups, for all these groups exhibit the normative dimension required to be classified as a ‘nomoi community’.

The normative conception of culture is usually associated with the semiotic, in the sense that one does not contradict the other; in fact, they may be complementary. For instance, Taylor endorses both perspectives of culture. However, this is not necessary because the system of meaning and significance does not need to provide moral reasons in order to motivate action. From the semiotic perspective, what someone is is not necessarily his or her moral commitments; it can be anything within the system. That is, the system of meaning may be based on anything while, according to the normative conception of culture, culture is strong source of one’s moral commitments.

To explain how the semiotic and normative conceptions of culture can be compatible, consider Taylor’s conception of culture. Taylor considers that individuals are self-interpreting animals. The fact that individuals are thus entails that human existence is constituted by meanings. From the normative point of view, these meanings are moral evaluations/strong evaluations. This refers to the distinctions of worth that individuals make regarding objects of desire. In other words, it is a background of distinctions between things that individuals consider important or worthy and those things which are considered less valuable. From the normative perspective of culture, individuals direct their lives and purposes towards what they consider morally worthwhile. In short, these strong evaluations or moral frameworks are what indicate to individuals what is meaningful and rewarding. That is, they are motivated by these evaluations (Taylor, 1974). Therefore, the self has a moral dimension, in the sense that rationality and identity refer to moral evaluations. Identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is constituted by their self-interpretations, which are ultimately provided by strong evaluations (Taylor, 1974). These moral beliefs or strong evaluations are in turn provided by an individual’s culture–that is why this can be considered a normative conception of culture.

c. The Societal Conception

The societal conception of culture is a concept mainly used by the Canadian philosopher Kymlicka. In order to understand this, it is helpful to consider Kymlicka’s dual typology of the sources of diversity that exist in contemporary societies; for Kymlicka there are two kinds of diversity: polyethnic minorities and national minorities.

Kymlicka uses the term polyethnicity to refer to the kind of diversity resulting from immigration. Polyethnic minorities refer to what is commonly defined as ethnic groups. According to him, polyethnic groups are usually not territorially concentrated; rather they are dispersed around the country to which they migrated. Furthermore, Kymlicka affirms that they do not usually want to be segregated from the culture of the majority; rather they want to integrate with it, demanding policies that give them equal citizenship. For instance, these groups demand language rights, voting rights, places in parliament and so forth. However, even though this demand for equal citizenship is usually what polyethnic groups aspire to, this is not always the case. Kymlicka contends that polyethnic groups can be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal groups (Kymlicka, 2001, pp. 55-58). Liberal polyethnic groups have aspirations that do not go against liberal values, usually aspiring to be integrated into society, demanding policies for equal citizenship. As an example, Kymlicka usually refers to Latin-American immigrants living in the United States, who, in broad terms, make demands for language rights, such as an education curriculum in Spanish.

On the other hand, for Kymlicka, illiberal polyethnic groups are those where the culture and the demands to the state are not in accordance with liberal values. For example, some religious minority ethnic groups advocate the death penalty for gays within their groups; others have gendered and discriminatory norms in relation to divorce and marriage. Some of these groups have demands that are more similar to the ones of national minorities but Kymlicka contends that these cases are the exception, not the rule (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 11-26, 97-99).

Polyethnic groups are not, in Kymlicka’s view, considered a culture; according to him, only nations are a culture. Kymlicka (1995, p. 18) uses the term nation interchangeably with the terms culture, people and societal culture, for example, “I am using ‘a culture’ as synonymous with ‘a nation’ or ‘a people’—that is, as an intergenerational community, more or less institutionally complete, occupying a given territory or homeland, sharing a distinct language and history”. In Kymlicka’s view, national minorities are a group in a society with a societal culture and a smaller number of members than the majority. Hence, a national minority is a societal culture where the amount of members is smaller in number than the amount of members of the majority. For Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) a societal culture is a kind of social setting that provides individuals with meaningful ways of life, both in the public and private sphere. These societal cultures are important mainly because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. More precisely for Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) due to the fact that societal cultures provide meaningful ways of life, they provide the social context that individuals need in order to make their own choices (that is, to be autonomous). Kymlicka’s rationale is that autonomy is only possible in certain social contexts and that social context is set up by societal cultures.

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities or minority societal cultures usually share a number of characteristics. First, national minorities have settled in the country long ago. For example, most of the Amish communities in Pennsylvania settled there in the eighteenth century, as a result of religious persecution in Europe. Aborigines in Australia and many Native American groups in the USA have lived in that territory for a long period. Second, from Kymlicka’s point of view, these groups are often territorially concentrated; for example, Quebec and Catalonia are situated in specific geographic areas of Canada and Spain, respectively. In India, Sikhs are geographically concentrated mostly in the Punjab region. Third, according to Kymlicka, the institutions and practices of these groups provide a full range of human activities; this means that nations are embodied in common economic, political and educational institutions. These institutions are not based only on shared meanings, memories and values but include common practices and procedures. Put differently, nations are institutionally complete in the sense that they encompass a wide institutional elaboration that encompasses a variety of areas of life; they have their own governments, laws, schools and so forth. In Kymlicka’s view, the fourth characteristic that national minorities have in common is that they usually aspire to either total or partial segregation from the larger society. That is, these groups wish to be a totally or partially separate society, with a different state, governed by their own laws and institutions. Hence, national minorities, in Kymlicka’s view, do not want to integrate in the larger society; rather they wish to be able to have a certain degree of autonomy. For example, many Quebecois want to be able to have their own government institutions, run in the way they wish, like schools run in French. Often, the Amish want to be left alone, without intervention from the state in their internal affairs. More precisely, one of the demands of some Amish communities is that they are exempt from the basic educational requirements that other citizens of the USA have to abide by, namely, the minimum literacy requirements. This, as will be explained later on, relates to other set of normative questions about what groups can and cannot impose to their members. In order to address this problem, Kymlicka draws a distinction between practices that can be imposed (external protections) and practices that cannot be imposed (internal restrictions).

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities can further be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal minorities. The former are those whose demands are compatible with liberal values, that is, their demands do not violate individuals’ rights and liberties. Under the concept of liberal national minorities are examples like Quebecois and Catalonians; these national minorities usually demand the right to use a different language in schools and their other institutions, and this does not necessarily violate any liberal value. The concept of illiberal national minorities refers to groups that wish to endorse illiberal values, like the death penalty for gays and lesbians.

d. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach

Rational choice is a theory that aims to explain and predict social behavior. From the viewpoint of rational choice, individuals act self-interestedly when they take into consideration their preferences and the information available. Self-interest means that individuals tend to maximize what is valuable for them. In other words, human behavior is goal-oriented. It is goal oriented by its preferences, that is, individuals act according to their preferences. For instance, if an individual prefers a hot chocolate to a vanilla milkshake or a strawberry milkshake and all the options are available, he will choose hot chocolate (other things being equal).

According to the rational choice view, the information available strongly affects behavior. By way of illustration, if an individual does not know that hot chocolate is available he will not choose it. Thus individuals act according to their self-interest, information and preferences. If a certain person’s preference is to buy the tastiest hot chocolate and this person has the information that the tastiest hot chocolate is sold ina particular store, then this person will act in order to achieve her/his own interest, that is, by going to that store and purchasing it there. Obviously, these actions are limited by the options available and by the actions of others. Therefore, if there is no hot chocolate on the market, this person will not be able to buy it–the option is not available because the suppliers decided not to offer hot chocolate. In this sense, an individual’s are dependent on their circumstances and on the actions of others.

With these premises in mind, a possible definition of culture from a rational choice perspective is provided by Laitin (2007, p. 64), whereby culture is:

an equilibrium in a well-defined set of circumstances in which members of a group sharing in common descent, symbolic practices and/or high levels of interaction—and thereby becoming a cultural group—are able to condition their behavior on common knowledge beliefs about the behavior of all members of the group.

Therefore, there are four key features of this conception of culture. First, a cultural group is a group in which individuals share a certain number of characteristics that differentiate them from other individuals–for example, language or religion. Second, all these individuals share a high degree of common knowledge. What common knowledge means in this context is that the members of a certain culture have shared information and mutual expectations about the actions and beliefs of others in the group. Third, there is a cultural equilibrium when the incentive to act or the self-interest to act is according to the beliefs of his or her own culture. More precisely, a cultural equilibrium occurs when individuals’ have an interest in acting in accordance with the norms and practices of their culture. These norms and practices can be any, but Laitin (2007) provides an insightful example with respect to the old Chinese tradition of foot binding. Laitin explains that it was very difficult for Chinese women to marry a man if they did not engage in the foot binding tradition. In this case, most Chinese parents forced their daughters to engage in this practice owing to the fact that their interest in finding a husband to their daughters was in accordance with the cultural practice of foot binding.  Finally, a well-defined set of circumstances can be described as a kind of situation where the type of interactions that members have with each other are ones of coordination and not conflict. That is, individuals’ actions are ones that are arranged in a way that match or complement each other, rather than being in conflict.

e. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism

The concepts of culture mentioned above have been strongly criticized by some political theorists. Some of these, who direct their criticisms mostly to the semiotic, normative and societal conceptions of culture, argue that these conceptions are essentialist views of culture that inaccurately describe social reality. However, as Festenstein (2005) has pointed out, these criticisms are sometimes misplaced, that is, these conceptions of culture do not necessarily need to be essentialist.

In general terms, from an essentialist point of view, there is a distinction between the essential and accidental properties that the different kinds of objects and subjects may have. Accidental properties are properties that are not necessarily present in all members of a certain group of objects or subjects. Essential properties are those that define the objects or subjects, that is, objects or subjects necessarily need to have these properties in order to be members of a certain group. Furthermore, members of other groups do not have this property or set of properties; otherwise they too would belong to this group. By way of illustration, a bookshelf in order to be a bookshelf has to necessarily be constructed in a way that makes it possible to hold books–this is its essential property. The fact that a specific bookshelf is brown, black or blue is an accidental property–it does not change what the object is and it is indifferent to its definition. These properties are necessary and sufficient not only to include a certain object or subject in the group but also to exclude any object or subject which does not share these properties. Bearing this in mind, it can be concluded that essences are given by differences and similarities; for what defines a subject is what it has in common with the subjects of the same group, which in turn is a characteristic that other groups do not have.

In terms of what this means to culture, it means identifying the social characteristics or attributes that make the group what it is, and that all members of that group necessarily share. Moreover, these characteristics are what differentiate members of that group from others and clearly exclude others (Young, 2000a, p. 87). For example, for an essentialist, to classify Muslims as Muslims means to identify a certain characteristic, like shared practices and beliefs, common to all of the individuals who identify as Muslims. Thus, essentialism applied to culture would be that a certain culture means having a certain characteristic or set of characteristics that all members share, and which no one outside the group does. Hence, from this point of view, the identity of the group is constituted by the set of properties or attributes which are essential to this particular group (Young, 2000a).

According to the critics of essentialism, this theory necessarily makes two wrong assumptions about culture. First, the critics state that essentialists wrongly affirm that cultures are clearly demarcated wholes and their practices and beliefs do not overlap with other cultures. Thus, according to this argument, essentialists wrongly affirm that beliefs and practices are exclusive to each culture. This premise is necessary for defending essentialism because from an essentialist point of view; different groups cannot share the same essential properties; otherwise they would belong to the same group. Second, essentialists, according to these critics, wrongly picture cultures as internally uniform or homogeneous. Put differently, essentialists consider that individuals with the same culture all agree and interpret practices in the same way. Furthermore, they all place the same value on the practices of the group. This second premise is necessary for essentialist thinking owing to the fact that a group has to have a property or a set of properties that is predicated of all individuals in order for them to be members of this group.

This essentialist perspective of culture has however been widely contested. The general argument is that essentialism stereotypes and makes abusive generalizations of what groups are. That is to say, according to the critics, essentialism is descriptively inaccurate. Criticism of this perspective contends that the first premise lacks empirical evidence. There is no evidence that there is any exclusivity in terms of practices and beliefs, in fact, evidence suggests the opposite; cultures borrow practices and beliefs in order to increase their fitness. Cultures are not bounded, owing to the fact that culture is constantly changing, influenced by local, national and global resources (Phillips, 2007a; 2010). Hence, according to this view, it is not possible to clearly demarcate the boundaries of cultures because they share a number of practices and beliefs. There is significant overlapping of cultures, especially in neighboring cultures. The distinction between cultures is, therefore, overemphasized–the boundaries between cultures not being clearly demarcated (Benhabib, 2002; Phillips, 2007a).

With regards to the second premise, the criticism contends that it is false to say that there is internal homogeneity inside a group in terms of needs, interests and beliefs. Rather, the social actors of cultural groups have different needs, interests and interpretations about the beliefs and practices of groups. Furthermore, in many cases, they consider these practices and beliefs quite contestable, discussable and open to different interpretations. Therefore, there is wide disagreement about cultural meaning (Benhabib, 2002). Anti-essentialists contend that there are too many exceptions to make essentialist claims. Therefore, there are a considerable number of counter-examples to this generalization (Phillips, 2007a; 2010; Schachar, 2001a). As a consequence, some anti-essentialists usually argue that these categories should be substituted by thinner categories. Thus, rather than speaking about women, one should speak about black women, or lesbian Muslim women.

Taking this into consideration, different, more flexible conceptions of culture have been suggested; perhaps the most well-known being the cosmopolitan conception of culture, defended by Waldron. In Waldron’s view, cultures are dynamic and in continuous creation and interchange (Waldron, 1991). Consequently, cultures overlap with each other, making it impossible to attribute exclusive properties to one single culture and to differentiate between them. In other words, according to this view, there is a mélange of cultures because people move between cultures by enjoying the opportunities that each provides. Hence, individuals live in a kaleidoscope of cultures, within which they enjoy and borrow practices (Waldron, 1996).

A question that arises is whether this criticism entails that any attempt to define culture is mistaken. Some anti-essentialists like Narayan (1998) contend that this is not the case. Rather, she contends that cultures can be defined if two points are taken into consideration. First, cultures are fluid and constantly changing; hence, any definition of culture should consider that cultures are always in flux. Second, broader categories should be substituted by thinner categories. This means that rather than using terms like ‘African Culture’, one should use terms like ’Tutsi culture in Rwanda’.

2. The Concept of Multiculturalism

In general terms, within contemporary political philosophy, the concept of multiculturalism has been defined in two different ways. Sometimes the term ‘multiculturalism’ is used as a descriptive concept; other times it is defined as a kind of policy for responding to cultural diversity. In the next section, the definition of multiculturalism as a descriptive concept will be explained, followed by a clarification of what it means to use the term ‘multiculturalism’ as a policy.

a. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society

The term ‘multiculturalism’ is sometimes used to describe a condition of society; more precisely, it is used to describe a society where a variety of different cultures coexist. Many countries in the world are culturally diverse. Canada is just one example, including a variety of cultures such as English Canadians, Quebecois, Native Americans, Amish, Hutterites and Chinese immigrants. China is another country that can also be considered culturally diverse. In contemporary China, there are 56 officially recognized ethnic groups, and 55 of these groups are ethnic minorities who make up approximately 8.41 percent of China’s overall population. The other ethnic group is that of Han Chinese, which holds majority status (Han, 2013; He, 2006).

There are a variety of ways whereby societies can be diverse, for example, culture can come in many forms (Gurr, 1993, p. 3). Perhaps the chief ways in which a country can be culturally diverse is by having different religious groups, different linguistic groups, groups that define themselves by their territorial identity and variant racial groups.

Religious diversity is a widespread phenomenon in many countries. India can be given as an example of a country which is religiously diverse, including citizens who are Sikhs, Hindus, Buddhists, among other religious groups. The US is also religiously diverse, including Mormons, Amish, Hutterites, Catholics, Jews and so forth. These groups differentiate from each other via a variety of factors. Some of these are the Gods worshiped, the public holidays, the religious festivals and the dress codes.

Linguistic diversity is also widespread. In the 21st century, there are more than 200 countries in the world and around 6000 spoken languages (Laitin, 2007). Linguistic diversity usually results from two kinds of groups. First, it results from immigrants who move to a country where the language spoken is not their native language (Kymlicka, 1995). This is the case for those Cubans and Puerto Ricans who immigrated to the United States; it is also the case for Ukrainian immigrants who moved to Portugal.

The second kind of groups that are a cause of linguistic diversity are national minorities. National minorities are groups that have either settled in the country for a long time, but do not share the same language with the majority. Some examples include Quebecois in Canada, Catalans and Basques in Spain, and the Uyghur in China. Usually, these linguistic groups are territorially concentrated; furthermore, minority groups that fall into this category usually demand a high degree of autonomy. In particular, minority groups usually demand that they have the regional power to self-govern, that is, to run their territory as if it was an independent country or to succeed and become a different country.

A third kind of group diversity can results from distinct territory location. This territory location does not necessary mean that members of distinct cultures are, in fact, different. That is, it is not necessary that habits, traditions, customs, and so forth are significantly different. However, these distinct groups identify themselves as different from others because of the specific geographical area in which they are located. Possibly, in the UK, this is what distinguishes Scots from English. Even though there are historical differences between Scots and English, if one assumes that these two groups have little to distinguish themselves from each other, other than their geographical location, they would fit this third kind of group diversity. As mentioned above, these differences are conceptual and, in practice, cultural groups are characterized by a variety of features and not just one.

The fourth kind of group diversity is race. Races are groups whose physical characteristics are imbued with social significance. In other words, race is a socially constructed concept in the sense that it is the result of individuals giving social significance to a set of characteristics they consider that stand out in a person's physical appearance, such as skin color, eye color, hair color, bone/jaw structure and so forth. However, the mere existence of different physical characteristics does not mean that there is a multicultural environment/society. For instance, it cannot be affirmed that Sweden is multicultural because there are Swedes with blue eyes and others with green. Physical characteristics create a multicultural environment only when these physical characteristics mean that groups strongly identify with their physical characteristics and where these physical characteristics are socially perceived as something that strongly differentiates them from other groups. That is, racial cultural diversity is not simply the existence of different physical characteristics. Rather, these different physical characteristics must entail a sense of common identity which, in turn, are socially perceived as something that differentiates the members of that group to others. However, many times this idea of common identity is exaggerated, as Waldron’s argument suggests. For instance, even though there is the idea that a black culture exists in the United States, Appiah (1996) denies that such black culture exists, since there is no common identity among blacks in the United States. An example of a physical difference that is considered socially significant and, therefore, creates a multicultural society/environment can be seen in the Tutsis and Hutus of Rwanda. In general terms, Tutsis and Hutus are very similar, due to the fact that they speak the same language, share the same territory and follow the same traditions. Nevertheless, Tutsis are usually taller and thinner than Hutus. The social significance given to these physical differences are sufficient for members of both groups, broadly speaking, to identify as members of one group or the other, and subsequently oppose to each other.

Obviously, groups are not, most of the time, identified only by being linguistically different, territorially concentrated or religiously distinct. In fact, most groups have more than one of these characteristics. For instance, Sikhs in India, besides being religiously different, are also characterized, in general terms, by their geographical location. Namely, they are localized in the Punjab region of India. The Uyghur, from China, have a different language, are usually Muslims and are usually located in Xinjiang. Thus, the classification is helpful for understanding the characteristics of each group, but does not mean that these groups are simply defined by that characteristic.

b. Multiculturalism as a Policy

The term ‘multiculturalism’ can also be used to refer to a kind of policy. This kind of policy has two main characteristics. First, it aims at addressing the different demands of cultural groups. That is, it is a kind of policy that refers to the different normative challenges (ethnic conflict, internal illiberalism, federal autonomy, and so forth) that arise as a result of cultural diversity. For example, these are policies that aim at addressing the different normative challenges that arise from minority groups, like Quebecois, wishing to have their own institutions in a different language from the rest of Canada. To contrast with redistributive policies, multicultural policies are not primarily about distributive justice, that is, who gets what share of resources, although multicultural policies may refer to redistribution accidentally (Fraser, 2001). Multicultural policies aim at correcting the kind of disadvantages that some individuals are victims of, and that result from these individuals’ cultural identity. For instance, these are policies that aim at correcting a disadvantage that may result from someone being a member of a certain religion. In the case of some Muslims, this can mean addressing the problem of Muslims living in a Christian country and demanding different public holidays than the majority to celebrate their own festivals such as Eid-al-Fitr.

Second, multicultural policies are policies that aim at providing groups the means by which individuals can pursue their cultural differences. Put differently, multicultural policies have as their objectives, the preservation, allowance or celebration of differences between different groups. Consequently, multicultural policies contrast with assimilation. That is, according to the assimilationist view, it is acceptable that people are different, but the final goal of policies should be to make the minority group become part of the majority group, that is, to be accepted by those in the majority group, and to somehow find a consensus position between different cultures. Contrastingly, multiculturalism acknowledges that people have different ways of life and, in general terms, the state ought not to assimilate these groups but to give them the tools for pursuing their own ways of life or culture. That is, from a multiculturalist point of view, the final objective of policies is neither the standardization of cultural forms nor any form of uniformity or homogeneity; rather, its objective is to allow and give the means for groups to pursue their differences.

According to Kymlicka, in the context of contemporary liberal political philosophy, there have been two waves of writings on multiculturalism (Kymlicka, 1999a). This discussion of what policies ought to be undertaken in order to protect minority cultures is included in what Kymlicka called the first wave of the wave of writings on multiculturalism. In his view (1999a, p. 112), the first wave of writing focused on assessing to what extent it is just, from a liberal point of view, to give rights to groups so that they can pursue their cultural differences. In this first wave of writings, contemporary liberal political philosophers have discussed what kind of inequalities exist between majorities and minorities, and how these should be addressed. In other words, the discussion has been about what kind of intergroup inequalities exist, and what the state should do about them. In general terms, contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written about this topic have taken two different stands. On the one hand, some liberal political philosophers defend that state institutions should be blind to difference and that individuals should be given a uniform set of rights and liberties. In these authors’ views, cultural diversity, religious freedom and so forth are sufficiently protected by these sets of rights and liberties, especially by freedom of association and conscience. Therefore, those who stand for a uniform set of rights and liberties contend that ascribing rights on the basis of membership in a group is a discriminatory and immoral policy that creates citizenship hierarchies that are undesirable and unjust (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-113). Thus, in the view of these contemporary liberal philosophers, involvement in the cultural character of society is something that the state is under the duty to not do.

On the other hand, some philosophers have taken the opposite view on this matter. For example, there are some contemporary liberal political philosophers who are more sympathetic to the idea of ascribing rights to groups and have defended difference-sensitive policies. As Kymlicka (1999a, p. 112) points out, these contemporary liberal political philosophers have tried to show that difference-sensitive rules are not inherently unjust. In general terms, these contemporary political philosophers argue that a regime of difference-sensitive policies does not necessarily entail a hierarchization of citizenship and unfair privileges for some groups. Rather, they argue that difference-sensitive policies aim at correcting intergroup inequalities and disadvantages in the cultural market. Moreover, some of these philosophers contend that difference-blind policies favor the needs, interests and identities of the majority (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-114). These philosophers who consider that groups are entitled to special rights can be classified as a form of multicultural citizenship.

Those who defend special rights for groups have suggested a variety of policies. In his book The Multiculturalism of Fear, Levy (2000, pp. 125-160) systematically exposed the kinds of difference-sensitive policies that are usually discussed in the literature. According to him, difference-sensitive policies can be divided into eight categories: exemptions, assistance, symbolic claims, recognition/enforcement, special representation, self-government, external rules and internal rules.

Exemptions to laws are usually rights based on a negative liberty of non-interference from the state in a specific affair, which would cause a significant burden to a certain group. Or, to put it another way, exemptions to the law happen when the state abstains from interfering with or obliging a certain group who desire to practice something in order to diminish their burden. Exemptions can also be a limitation of someone else’s liberty to impose some costs on a certain group. Imagine that there is a general law that decrees corporations have the right to impose a dress code upon their employees. However, having this general law would burden those groups for whom dressing in a certain manner (that is, different from the one required by the company) is a very important value. For example, for many Sikh men and Muslim women it is very important to wear turbans and headscarves, respectively. Hence, it can be claimed that giving these individuals the option of either finding another job or rejecting their dress code can be a significant burden to them; given that the choice of dressing in a certain way is sometimes much harder for Sikh men and Muslim women than for a Westerner, and that it would undermine their identity, an exemption may be justified (Levy, 2000, pp. 128-133). Hence, these groups would be able to engage in practices that are not allowable for the majority of citizens.

Assistance rights aim to aid individuals in overcoming the obstacles they face because they belong to a certain group. In other words, assistance rights aim to rectify disadvantages experienced by certain individuals, as a result of their membership of a certain group, when compared to the majority. This can mean funding individuals to pursue their goals or using positive discrimination to help them in a variety of ways. Language rights are an example of this approach. Suppose that some individuals from Catalonia cannot speak Spanish. An assistance measure would be having people speak both Spanish and Catalan at public institutions, so that they can serve people from the minority as well the minority language group. Another example would be awarding subsidies to help groups preserve their cohesion by maintaining their practices and beliefs, and by allowing individuals from a minority to participate in public institutions as full citizens. Most of these practices are temporary, but they do not need to be (language rights, for example, are often not temporary) (Levy, 2000, pp. 133-137).

Symbolic claims refer to problems which do not affect individuals’ lives directly or seriously, but which may make the relations between individuals from different groups better. In a multicultural country, where there are multiple religions, ethnicities and ways of life, it may not make sense to have certain symbols that represent only a specific culture. Symbolic claims are ones that require, on the grounds of equality, the inclusion of all the cultures in a specific country in that country’s symbols. An example would be including Catholic, Sikh, Muslim, Protestant, Welsh, Northern Irish, Scottish, and English symbols on both the British flag and in the national anthem. Not integrating minority symbols may be considered as dispensing a lack of respect and unequal treatment to minorities.

Recognition is a demand for integrating a specific law or cultural practice into the larger society. If individuals want to integrate a specific law, they can ask for the law to become part of the major legal system. Hence, Sharia law could form part of divorce law for Muslims, while Aboriginal law could run in conjunction with Australian property rights law. It could also be a requirement to include certain groups in the history books used in schools–for example, to include the history of Indian and Pakistani immigrants in British history textbooks. Failing to integrate this law may bring a substantive burden to bear on individuals’ identity. In the Muslim case, because family law is of crucial importance to their identity, they may be considerably burdened by having to abide by a Western perspective of divorce. With regards to Aboriginal law, because hunting is essential for their way of life, if other individuals own the(ir) land this may undermine the Aboriginal culture.

Special representation rights are designed to protect groups which have been systematically unrepresented and disadvantaged in the larger society. Minority groups may be under-represented in the institutions of a society, and in order to place them in a position of equal bargaining power, it is necessary to provide special rights to the members of these groups. Hence, these rights aim to defend individuals’ interests in a more equal manner by guaranteeing some privileges or preventing discrimination. One way to achieve this is by setting aside extra seats for minorities in parliament (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 131-152; Levy, 2000, pp. 150-154).

Self-government rights are usually what are claimed by national minorities (for example, Pueblo Indians and Quebecois) and they usually demand some degree of autonomy and self-determination. This sometimes implies demands for exclusive occupation of land and territorial jurisdiction. The reason groups sometimes may need these rights is that the kind of autonomy they give is a necessary condition by which individuals can develop their cultures, which is in the best interest of a culture’s members. More precisely, a specific educational curriculum, language right or jurisdiction over a territory may be a necessary requirement for the survival and prosperity of a particular culture and its members. This is compatible with both freedom and equality; it is compatible with freedom because it allows individuals access to their culture and to make their own choices; it is consistent with equality because it places individuals on an equal footing in terms of cultural access (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 27-30; Levy, 2000, pp. 137- 138).

What Levy classifies as external rules can be considered as kinds of rights for self-government. They involve restricting other people’s freedom in order to preserve a certain culture. Hence, Aborigines in Australia employ external safeguards to protect their land. For example, freedom of movement is limited to outsiders who circulate in Aboriginal territory; furthermore, outsiders do not have the right to buy Aboriginal land. Demands that groups make for internal rules are those demands that aim at restricting individuals’ behavior within the group. Stigmatizing, ostracizing or excommunicating individuals from groups because they have not abided by the rules is what is usually meant by internal rules. Thus, this is the power given to groups to treat their members in a way that is not acceptable for the rest of society. An example can be if a certain individual marries someone from another group, which may then mean he is expelled from his own group. Another case is that of the Amish who want their children to withdraw from school earlier than the rest of society. In contrast to external rules, the restrictions on freedom apply to members of the group and not to outsiders. It is controversial whether internal rules are compatible with liberal values or not. On the one hand, authors like Kymlicka affirm they are not, because they undermine individuals’ autonomy, which is, in his view, a central liberal value. On the other hand, philosophers like Kukathas contend that liberals are committed to tolerance and, thereby, should accept some internal restrictions.

i. Multicultural Citizenship

Generally speaking, the philosophy of those authors who defend a multicultural citizenship, have five points in common. Firstly, they all contend that the state has the duty to support laws which defend the basic legal, civil and political rights of its citizens. Secondly, they argue that the state should participate in the construction of societal cultural character, thus its laws and policies should aim to protect culture. Thirdly, these philosophers contend that the character of culture is normative. Consequently, and this is the fourth common feature, individuals’ interest in culture is sufficiently strong enough that it needs to be supported by the state. Fifth, they both defend difference-sensitive/multicultural citizenship policies for protecting culture. Some of the philosophers who defend a multicultural citizenship are Taylor, Kymlicka and Shachar.

1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition

According to Taylor, there are two forms of recognition; intimate recognition and public recognition. Taylor (1994b, p. 37) mainly discusses the idea of public recognition or recognition in the public sphere. This form of recognition is about respect and esteem for one’s identity in the public realm; being misrecognized in the public realm means to have one’s identity disrespected in a way whereby one is treated as a second-class citizen. Being misrecognized, in this sense, is to have an unequal citizenship status in virtue of one’s identity. Hence, someone is misrecognized in the public sphere if one has a legal disadvantage that results from one’s identity. To have respect and esteem for someone in the public sphere means to have citizenship rights that do not disadvantage one’s identity. In Taylor’s view, misrecognition can potentially be a form of oppression and helps to create self-hating images in those who are misrecognized. Bearing this in mind, recognition is a vital human need because the relation between recognition and identity (the way people understand who they are) is relatively strong; hence, misrecognition or non-recognition may have a serious harmful effect on individuals

In order to discuss the best way to achieve recognition in the public realm, Taylor draws a distinction between procedural and non-procedural forms of liberalism. He affirms that, according to the procedural version of liberalism, a just society is one where all individuals have a uniform set of rights and freedoms, and having different rights for different people creates distinctions between first-class and second-class citizens: this liberalism is only committed to individual rights and rejects the idea of collective rights. The state, according to this version of liberalism, should not be involved in the cultural character of society and the procedures of this society must be independent of any particular set of values held by the citizens of that polity. In other words, the state should be neutral and independent of any conception of the good life.

In Taylor’s (1994b, p. 60) view, procedural liberalism is inhospitable to difference and is unable to accommodate different cultures. Taylor believes that, in some cases, collective goals need to be aided so that they can be achieved. Sometimes cultural communities need to have power over certain jurisdictions so that they can promote their own culture; this is something that a procedural liberalism does not offer, according to Taylor. Due to the fact that Taylor considers recognition as important, this kind of liberalism that is inhospitable to difference should be rejected; rather, in Taylor’s view, a non-procedural liberalism that is involved in the cultural character of society in a way that enhances cultural diversity and is not hostile to difference is the kind of liberalism that should be endorsed. From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism is not neutral between different ways of life and it is grounded in judgments of what the good life is. According to Taylor, this liberalism takes into account differences between individuals and groups and by taking these into account it creates an environment that is not hostile to the flourishing of different cultures. Engaging in policies that promote culture is, in Taylor’s view, extremely important; cultural communities deserve protection owing to the fact that they provide members with the basis of their identities. The language of cultures provides the framework for the question of who one is. Taylor believes that identity is strongly influenced by culture; therefore, there is a moral and social framework given by the language of one’s culture that individuals need in order to make sense of their lives. Therefore, recognition and protection of individuals’ cultural communities is required for respecting and preserving one’s identity. However, in Taylor’s view, this commitment to promoting difference is acceptable only if the measures taken to promote difference are constant with what he considers to be fundamental rights. Taylor specifically mentions the rights to life, liberty, due process, free speech and free practice of religion.

From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism has implications for public policy. It means that there should be decentralized power so that communities can flourish. However, what this decentralization and non-procedural liberalism imply in practice depends on the context; in different countries with different kinds of minorities there may be different implications. Taylor mostly writes about the Canadian context and he believes that in this context the best policy is a form of federalism. In his view, Quebec should be given self-government rights so that it has power over a certain number of policies. In particular, Taylor affirms that it should have sovereign power over art, technology, economy, labor, communications, agriculture, and fisheries. In the case of language policies, Taylor contends that in some cases it is justified to violate liberal values, like freedom of expression, in order to protect the language of a community. For instance, in the case of Quebec, communications in English can be restricted by the state in order to promote the French language.  Another example is that offspring of French parents do not have the option of choosing a language of instruction that is not French. Moreover, it should have shared power with the majority in immigration, industrial policy and environmental policy. Control over defense, external affairs and currency is given to the federal government. It is important to emphasize that, in Taylor’s view, federalism is not a necessary implication of non-procedural liberalism. Federalism is not at the core of the recognition idea; rather, federalism is a kind of system that Taylor considers is the adequate option in the Canadian context, which does not mean it is a good option in all contexts.

2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism

Kymlicka believes that group rights are compatible and promote the liberal values of freedom and equality. As a result, Kymlicka offers arguments that relate freedom and equality with group rights. The argument based on freedom is strongly related to his idea of societal culture. In Kymlicka’s perspective (1995, p. 80), societal cultures promote freedom. From Kymlicka’s point of view, the reason why societal cultures are important for freedom is because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. In particular, according to Kymlicka, because societal cultures provide a framework with meaningful ways of life, then they provide the social conditions that are necessary for individuals to make autonomous choices. Autonomy, in turn, is only possible if and only if these social conditions are the ones of individuals’ societal cultures.

Taking this on board, Kymlicka’s argument is that societal cultures ought to be protected because they promote the liberal value of autonomy; they promote this value because societal cultures give, in Kymlicka’s perspective, a context of choice that is necessary for individuals to exercise their freedom. Put differently, from Kymlicka’s point of view, individuals’ own cultures provide the groundwork that individuals need in order to make free choices. Consequently, if liberals are committed to this value, they are committed to protecting the conditions (societal cultures) to achieve it. This means that if group rights are necessary for protecting this context of choice, then they are justified from a liberal point of view; for if group rights can protect the context of choice, then they are promoting autonomy. As mentioned above, from the three sources of diversity only national minorities have societal cultures. Hence, this argument only justifies group rights for national minorities in order to protect their societal cultures. In Kymlicka’s view, the context of choice is given by the access to one’s own culture, not just to any culture. So according to this view, for someone from Quebec, the societal culture of Catalonia does not provide a context of choice; likewise, for someone from an Amish community, the societal culture of Sikhs in India does not provide this Amish individual with a context of choice.

The three arguments based on equality that Kymlicka offers for defending group rights rely on a different line of reasoning. The first argument starts by observing that there is an inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state and it is impossible to be completely neutral. Kymlicka affirms that the decisions made by governments, like what public holidays to have, unavoidably promote a certain cultural identity. Consequently, those individuals who do not share the culture promoted by the state are disadvantaged. In other words, they are in an unequal position. More precisely, by observing the unequal treatment that results from the inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state, Kymlicka contends that uniform laws giving the same rights to all individuals from different cultures treat individuals unequally. To take the example of public holidays, the establishment of Christian public holidays disadvantages Muslims because their main festival, Eid-al-Fitr, occurs at a time of the year when there are no public holidays. Bearing this in mind, Kymlicka argues that if liberals are committed to equality, then they should endorse a kind of public policy that does not advantage some individuals over others; this, in turn, means that in order to equalize the status of different groups, the state ought to entitle different groups to different rights.

In Kymlicka’s view, group rights can correct these inequalities by providing the necessary and sufficient means by which individuals can pursue their culture. Although the argument for autonomy only applies to national minorities, this argument based on equality refers to national minorities and polyethnic groups. Inequalities between majorities and national minorities can take many shapes, but an example that Kymlicka likes to use is language rights inequalities. From his point of view, national linguistic minorities like those of Quebec and Catalonia would be treated unequally if they did not have the right to have their own institutions in their national language. The debate about Christian and Muslim holidays is an example of inequalities between majorities and polyethnic groups. Taking this on board, it is Kymlicka’s (1995) conviction that the two kinds of diversity can potentially be treated unequally by a set of uniform laws. As a result, any of these three kinds of diversity are entitled to group rights on grounds of promoting equality between groups within a liberal state.

Kymlicka’s second argument based on equality is that if it is the case that all individuals in society should have it, then the state is committed to promote a variety of cultures so that individuals have more options relating to choice. This argument, however, is not directed at minorities but rather at majorities, and it does not refer to a need of the minority; instead, it refers to how culture can make individuals’ lives better in general, by providing more options. Furthermore, Kymlicka (1995, p. 121) considers that because it is difficult to change one’s culture, this would not be a very attractive choice for everyone.

The third argument is that, according to Kymlicka, liberals should respect historical agreements. In Kymlicka’s view, many of the rights that minority cultures have in the early 21st century are the result of historical agreements. If the state is to treat individuals from different cultures with equal respect, then it should respect these agreements.

3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation

Shachar is another philosopher who has defended a kind of multicultural citizenship. Shachar endorses a joint governance model that she calls transformative accommodation. According to Shachar, this model relies on four assumptions. First, individuals have a multiplicity of identities. For example, Malcolm X was a Muslim, a male, an African-American, and a heterosexual. Hence, individuals have a multiplicity of affiliations that play a role in their identities. The second assumption is that both the group and the state have normative and legal reasons to shape behavior. There may be a variety of reasons for this, but at least one of them is that individuals have a strong interest both in preserving their cultures and protecting their individual rights. Third, both what the state and the group do impact on each other. For instance, the laws that the state makes about same-sex marriage has an impact on heterosexist minority groups; the heterosexism of minority groups, like the hate speech of the Westboro Baptist Church, also impacts on the state. Fourth, both the state and the group have an interest in supporting their members (Shachar, 2001a, p. 118).

On top of these four assumptions, transformative accommodation is based on three core principles; sub-matter allocation of authority, no monopoly, and the clear establishment of delineated options (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 118-119). According to the sub-matters allocation of authority principle, the holistic view that contested social arenas (family law, criminal law, employment law and so forth) are indivisible is incorrect. According to this principle, these social arenas can be divisible into sub-matters, that is, into multiple separable components that are complementary (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 51-54). In practice, this means that norms and decisions about disputed social matters can be determined separately. In other words, in each area of law, there are sub-areas and these sub-areas are partially independent; as a result, a decision made in a sub-area can be made independently of a decision made in another sub-area. In Shachar’s view, family law, for example, can be divided into demarcating and distributive sub-matters or sub-areas. In her (2001a, pp. 119-120) view, the demarcating sub-matter of family law is where group membership boundaries are defined. That is, it is in this sub-matter that the necessary and sufficient attributes (biological, ethnical, territorial, ideological and so forth) for membership are decided. The distributive sub-matter refers to the distribution of resources. For instance, it would be in the demarcating sub-matter where it would be decided who gets what after divorce.

To illustrate how this principle would work in practice, Shachar routinely uses a legal dispute that occurred with a Native-American tribe and one of their members. This is the case of Julia Martinez; Julia Martinez, was a member of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe whose daughter’s membership of the group was rejected, a rejection leading to tragic consequences. In 1941, Julia Martinez, who was a daughter of members of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe married a man from outside the group. With this man, she had a daughter, who was raised in the Pueblo reservation, subsequently participating in and learning the norms and practices of the tribe. However, according to this tribe’s law, only the offspring of male members are considered members; hence, although Julia Martinez’ daughter was raised on the reservation, she was not, in the eyes of the tribe leaders, a tribe member. When Julia Martinez’s daughter got ill, she had to go to the emergency section of the Indian Health Services. Nevertheless, she was refused emergency treatment on grounds of not being a member of the tribe; a refusal that later caused her death (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 18-20). According to the sub-matters principle, in the case of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe, it would be the legislators in the demarcation sub-matter who would determine whether Julia Martinez’s daughter was a member of the tribe or not (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 52-54). Contrastingly, it would be in the distributive sub-matter would that her entitlement or not to use the Indian Health Services would be decided.

By establishing the second principle, the no monopoly rule, Shachar defends that jurisdictional powers should be divided between the state and the group. According to this principle, neither the state nor the group should hold absolute power over the contested social arenas. More precisely, the group should hold power over one sub-matter while the state should hold power over another. Consequently, legal decisions would result from an interdependent and cooperative relationship between the group and the state (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 120-122). In the case of family law, if there is a divorce dispute, the state could take control of distribution (for example, property division after divorce) and the group, demarcation (for example, who can request divorce and why) or vice-versa.

The third principle defended by Shachar is the definition of clearly delineated options. According to this principle, individuals should have clear options between choosing to abide by the state or the group jurisdiction. In particular, this means that individuals can either decide to abide by a jurisdiction or they can refuse to abide by it and exit that jurisdiction at predefined reversal points. These predefined reversal points are an agreement made between the state and the group, where it is decided when individuals can exit the group and in what circumstances.

ii. Negative Universalism

The other approach to the philosophical discussion about justice between groups can be called negative universalism (Festenstein, 2005). Two philosophers who endorse this approach are, according to Festenstein (2005), Barry and Kukathas. Despite the fact that the philosophies of Barry and Kukathas are different, as negative universalists, they have four features in common.

Firstly, both defend the neutrality of the state among different conceptions of the good. That is, individuals should be free to pursue their own conceptions of the good. Secondly, this impartiality does not have the same impact on all citizens’ lives, that is, some will be better-off than others. Nevertheless, this is not, according to these philosophers, a counter-argument against the liberal value of neutrality, because equality of impact is not a realistic goal. Thirdly, principles of liberal theory adopt ‘basic civil and political rights’ with differentiations that may be justified through fundamental basic rights such as freedom of thought and association. However, basic civil and political rights and justified deviations differ substantially when both are permitted simultaneously. Fourth, negative universalists are skeptical concerning the normative value of culture and about providing differentiated rights to individuals (Festenstein, 2005, pp. 91-92).

1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism

Barry’s view is that liberal egalitarianism is the philosophical doctrine that offers the most coherent and just approach to protect these interests. In addition, from his viewpoint, liberal egalitarianism offers the normative groundwork for the challenges that illiberal and heterosexist cultural groups raise. His liberal egalitarian approach, in particular, has as core values neutrality, freedom and equality.

According to Barry, neutrality means that states are under the duty of not promoting or favoring some conceptions of the good over others. In general terms, this means that state policy should not promote the survival and flourishing of a conception of the good, a language, a religion and so forth. Rather, neutrality requires that states be committed to individual rights without any sort of collective goal, besides those that correspond to universal basic interests. When the state favors a specific conception of the good by assisting it, it is violating neutrality (Barry, 2001, pp. 28, 29, 122). In Barry’s version of liberal neutrality, conceptions of the good are a private extra-political matter, which refer to personal affairs (Barry, 1995, p. 118). Hence, non-secular states, like Iran or Saudi Arabia, violate neutrality in Barry’s sense because they promote a specific religion.

The other important value for Barry, freedom, means not having paternalistic restrictions on pursuing one’s own conception of the good. This implies that individuals should be provided with a considerable amount of independence to pursue their own conceptions of the good. According to Barry, all individuals should be given the means for this pursuit. In practice, this means that all individuals are entitled to freedoms that enable them to pursue their own conceptions of the good and lifestyles; in particular, Barry considers that freedom of association and conscience play a fundamental role in enabling individuals in this pursuit. Individuals may choose to live a lifestyle that liberals may disapprove of; however, Barry (2001, p. 161) considers that bad choices are something that individuals in a liberal society are entitled to make.

Barry’s third commitment, the one to equality, translates into two core ideas. First, treating people equally means to furnish individuals with an equal set of basic legal, political and civil rights. That is, equality requires endorsing a unitary conception of citizenship. Second, the commitment to equality entails that the state has the duty to promote equality of opportunity. For Barry, there is an equal opportunity when uniform rules generate the same set of choices to all individuals (Barry, 2005). This means that there is equality of opportunity if and only if, in a specific situation, different individuals have the capacity to make the choice that is needed to achieve their aims. For example, imagine that Sam and John want both to be medical doctors; imagine that Sam is from a working class family and John from an upper class family. Sam does not have the economic resources to study, but John has. In such a situation, assuming that the economic factor is the only relevant factor for equalizing choice, in order to achieve equality of opportunity, Sam should be given a similar amount of economic resources to John, so that he has the same capacity to make the choice of a career in medicine. Therefore, equality of opportunity requires that individuals be treated according to their needs. Barry also argues that equality of opportunity entails that the is under the duty of equalizing choice sets, not equalizing the outcomes that result from the decisions people make in those choice sets.

Taking this normative groundwork on board, Barry offers six arguments against giving rights to cultural groups. Four of these are a result of his liberal theory; the other two are independent arguments not related to his theory.

The first argument against difference-sensitive policies for cultural groups presented by Barry is that this would be a violation of neutrality. For Barry, neutrality requires that there is no or little involvement in the cultural character of society; hence, if the state privileged a group either by promoting this group’s culture or by empowering the group with different rights from other groups, then the state would be violating neutrality. Barry believes that liberals are committed to non-interference in the cultural character of society; as a result, liberalism is incompatible with difference-sensitive policies. In practice, what this implies for multicultural demands is that any kind of exemption, recognition, assistance or any other kind of group right should be denied on the grounds of neutrality. For example, in Barry’s view, if a certain state does not criminalize homosexuality and the governing body of a minority religious group asks recognition of its religious courts that convict its gay members for same-sex acts, the state should not concede this recognition because doing so would be giving a different right to a different group and, therefore, it would be a violation of neutrality.

The second argument provided by Barry against group rights is that the unequal impact of policies on cultures is not an interference with freedom to pursue one’s own conception of the good. In Barry’s view, laws have the aim of protecting some interests against others; the fact that they have a different impact on a specific culture is not a sign of unfairness; rather, it is just a side effect of having laws (Barry, 2001, p. 34).

Third, in Barry’s view, the only group rights conceded, especially those exemptions to the law, are cultural practices that overlap with universal human interests. In other words, if the group right and, in particular the exemption to the law, promotes a universal human interest, then it is acceptable (Barry, 2001, pp. 48-50). For instance, Muslim girls cannot be refused education on the grounds of a minor issue such as dress codes, because education is a universal human interest.

Fourth, Barry contends that because neither culture nor cultural demands are a universal interest per se, then the unequal treatment that is acceptable for universal interests does not apply to these (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13, 16). To recall, Barry’s conception of equality of opportunity entails that individuals can be treated unequally so that their choice sets are equalized. However, Barry affirms that these choice sets should be equalized only if these are choice sets about universal interests, which culture is not. In short, exemptions can and should be guaranteed for universal or higher-order interests but not for particular interests.

These four arguments are dependent on Barry’s liberal theory; they depend on his conception of freedom, neutrality and equality. To these arguments, he adds two ad hoc arguments. First, that difference-sensitive rights that aim to protect economic resources are temporary, while cultural rights are permanent. This means that those who need economic resources to equalize their choice sets only need this aid temporarily (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13). Contrastingly, according to Barry, group rights to protect culture are required permanently. Like the case of the Sikh, a permanent law that exempted Sikhs from wearing helmets would be necessary. The other ad hoc argument is that when there is a reasonable argument it should be applied without exception. If there is a case for exception, then the rule should be abandoned. According to him, it is philosophically incoherent to provide a universal justification for a rule and then relativize the reason just given (Barry, 2001, pp. 32-50).

2. Kukathas' Libertarianism

Kukathas’ approach to multiculturalism is, broadly speaking, based on two ideas: these ideas are what he considers to be human beings’ most fundamental interest and his theory of freedom of association. Kukathas considers that human beings have only one fundamental interest: the interest in living according to their conscience. In his opinion, the reason for this is, in part, that human beings are primarily moral beings and, consequently, are disposed to direct their lives/purposes towards what they consider to be morally worthwhile. Consequently, from Kukathas’ point of view, individuals find it difficult to act against their conscience. This tendency to govern one’s own conduct primarily by conscience and the difficulty to act against one’s moral beliefs can, in Kukathas’ (2003b, p. 53) view, be observed and has empirical support. An additional reason why acting according to one’s own conscience is a fundamental interest is because, according to Kukathas, the meaning of life is given by conscience (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 55). Hence, Kukathas considers that identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is their self-interpretation, which ultimately is provided by moral evaluation. It is important to notice that this says nothing about what each person’s morality is. A human rights activist and a terrorist can be both acting according to their conscience even if they are doing opposite things. Owing to the fact that conscience is a fundamental interest, Kukathas contends that the state is under the duty to protect this interest.

The second important aspect of Kukathas’ philosophy is his defense of freedom of association. According to Kukathas, freedom of association is primarily defined as the right to exit groups, that is, freedom of association exists when individuals have the freedom to leave or dissociate from a group they are part of. In other words, essential to this version of freedom of association is the idea that individuals should not be forced to remain members of communities they do not wish to associate with. Therefore, according to this definition, freedom of association is not about the freedom of entering a specific group; rather, it is about the freedom to leave those groups that individuals want to dissociate from (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 95).

According to Kukathas, there are two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for individuals to have the freedom to exit. These conditions are that individuals are not physically barred from leaving, and that there is a place similar to a market society where they can exit. From Kukathas’ point of view, a place to go is a necessary requirement for exit because it would not be credible to think that individuals had a right to exit if all communities were organized on a basis of kinship, for the options available would be either conformity to the rules or loneliness.

According to this theory of freedom, the functions of the state are quite limited. In Kukathas’ style of freedom of association, the state is not duty bound to secure individuals’ access to healthcare, education, and so forth. These forms of welfare should be provided by associations, if those associations wish to provide them. According to Kukathas’ theory, the state should only intervene to guarantee the right to exit, preserving the ongoing order of society by guaranteeing the safety and security of its citizens and preventing civil war. In practice, this means that the state has two functions. First, the state has to guarantee that there is no violation of freedom of association, that is, that individuals within associations are not being forced to remain members by being physically barred from leaving. Second, it means that the state should regulate so that there is no aggression between associations. So, even though associations can endorse practices that are extremely aggressive towards their members, it is a requirement for Kukathas that there is mutual toleration between associations. Societies cannot commit acts of aggression towards each other and, if they do, the state can, in his view, legitimately intervene to stop this aggression.

Bearing in mind the functions of the state and the internal structure of associations, this society would be a society of societies. Each society or group would have its own legislation, that is, they would have jurisdictional independence (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 97). In Kukathas’ view, the validity of the laws of communities only have local recognition, that is, the state would not recognize same-sex marriage and so forth; rather the state would be indifferent to the way individuals associate.

From Kukathas’ point of view, this version of freedom of association is compatible with the imposition of high costs of exit/dissociation and membership due to the fact that the magnitude of costs in a choice are not related to freedom (Kukathas, 2003b, pp. 107-109). In his view, this model of freedom of association is the best way to protect individuals’ freedom of conscience because it gives few restrictions to what individuals can do and consequently allows a wide variety of practices. For instance, an ethnic community where the members, generally speaking, believe that female genital mutilation is an important practice and that it is immoral not to engage in this practice, would be, in Kukathas’ view, better off if they had the possibility to form their own association where the practice would be accepted, then if they were part of a larger community with regulations against such practice.

3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism

Taking this on board, in this first wave of writings on multiculturalism, the debate has centered on discussing the justice of difference-sensitive policies in the liberal context. On the whole, there are two difference positions taken by contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written on multiculturalism; some defend that difference-sensitive policies are justified, whereas others argue that they are a deviation from the core values of liberalism.

More recently, a second wave of writings on multiculturalism has appeared. In this, contemporary liberal political philosophers have not focused so much on debates about justice between different groups; rather, they have focused on justice within groups. Thus, the debate has changed to the analysis of the potentially perverse effects of policies to protect minority cultural groups with regard to the members of these minority cultural groups. Contemporary liberal political philosophers have now switched to discussing the practical implications that those that aimed at correcting inter-group equality could have for the members of those groups that the policies are directed to. In particular, the worry is that the policies for enabling members of minority groups to pursue their culture could favor some members of minority groups over others. That is, this new debate is about the risks that those policies for protecting cultural groups could have in undermining the status of the weaker members of these groups. The reason why philosophers worry about this is because the policies for multiculturalism may give the leaders of cultural groups’ power for making decisions and institutionalizing practices that facilitate the persecution of internal minorities. In other words, those policies may give group leaders all kinds of power that reinforce or facilitate cruelty and discrimination within the group (Phillips, 2007a, pp. 13-14; Reich, 2005, pp. 209-210; Shachar, 2001a, pp. 3, 4, 15-16).

Three kinds of internal minorities have received special attention from contemporary political philosophers: these are bisexuals, gays and lesbians, women and children.

a. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals

Some philosophers are concerned about how policies meant to protect minority cultural groups can potentially impose serious threats and harm the interests and rights of lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals. In some minority cultural groups, lesbian gay and bisexuals within minorities are very disadvantaged by the unintended consequences of multicultural politics (Levy, 2005; Swaine, 2005, pp. 44-45). Heterosexism is a cross-cutting issue in minority cultural groups (and society in general), covering diverse areas of life, ranging from basic freedoms and rights, employment, education, family life, economic and welfare rights, sexual freedom, physical and psychological integrity, safety, and so forth. In general terms, it can be affirmed that lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have an interest in bodily and psychological integrity, sexual freedom, participation in cultural and political life, family life, basic civil and political rights, economic and employment equality and access to welfare provision.

Sometimes, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have their freedom of association, opinion, expression, assembly, and thought limited (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 50-55). Minority cultural groups can jeopardize these interests due to hierarchies of power within groups. Some groups use a variety of norms of social control. Also in some groups, participation in political decisions and freedom of expression is culturally determined.

In some minority cultural groups, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interest in being free from murder, torture, and other cruel, inhuman and degrading treatment is also sometimes violated (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 13-16). Many lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals are victims of physical and psychological harassment, murder, hate speech, hate crimes, brutal sexual conversion therapies, and corrective rape, among other kinds of physical and psychological violence.

Some minority cultural groups also sometimes undermine lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interests in economic and welfare rights. In the case of employment, this refers to anti-discrimination law in the workplace and in admission for jobs. In some cases, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ freedom and the right to join the armed forces, to work with children, to employment benefits and health insurance for same-sex families are denied. Although not many religious groups have armed forces, this example could apply to the Swiss Army that protects the Vatican.

Bearing this in mind, some contemporary political philosophers have discussed to what extent giving special rights to groups can potentially facilitate the imposition of such unequal and cruel practices.

b. Women

Some philosophers, especially liberal feminist philosophers, have raised concerns about the implications of providing special rights to groups for women. Okin has contended that most cultures in the world are patriarchal and gendered and, consequently, providing rights to groups may help with reinforcing oppressive gendered and patriarchal practices. Some of the practices that may jeopardize women’s rights are female genital mutilation, polygamy, the use of headscarves, and a lesser valuation of the career and education of women.

Female genital mutilation, a practice that some communities engage in, is considered by some feminists to be a cruel practice that undermines the sexual health of women and aims at controlling their bodies. Polygamy is a practice that some communities follow, with some feminists contending that this practice is deeply disrespectful to women, and a clear way of treating women unequally. The use of headscarves is considered by some feminists to be a way of controlling women’s bodies and showing submission to males. Taking this on board, the concern expressed by some feminists is that empowering groups with special rights may reinforce female oppression. For example, if some communities are exempt from the health practices of the majority of society, this may help them to perpetuate and spread the practice of female genital mutilation.

Nevertheless, it is important to emphasize that the view that cultures are necessarily patriarchal, gendered and oppressive for women is not a unanimous position among feminists. Indeed, Volpp (2001) and Phillips (2007a), for instance, have defended the position that many feminists take an ethnocentric point of view when analyzing minority practices and misunderstand the true meaning of practices. Furthermore, Volpp and Phillips contend that many women in minority cultures are agents capable of making their own choices; therefore some of those practices that can be considered oppressive from a Western point of view should not be banned.

c. Children

The implications of special rights to children who are members of minority cultures is also a topic that has received some attention from contemporary political philosophers (Reich, 2005). The concerns with respect to children are especially with regards to physical and psychological abuse and lack of education. With respect to physical and psychological abuse, some groups may have practices that are harmful for children. For example, some groups practice shunning, a practice that consists of ostracizing those who do not follow their norms or who have done something that is disapproved of by the community. The traditional scarification of children that some African communities practice is also a practice that may be considered to entail physical abuse. With respect to education, there are groups who wish to take their children out of school at an earlier age. Some may argue that removing children from school earlier than their peers may strongly disadvantage these children because they will potentially not acquire the minimum skills necessary to find a job, and will not receive enough education to make autonomous choices. Other groups consider that education should be mainly about the study of the religious scripture, and they sometimes disregard other kinds of education.

Owing to the fact that schools are a central vehicle of autonomy and cultural transmission and because children are at a formative age and, thereby, much more likely to be influenced by the way they are brought up, some political philosophers have shown concern about the impact of giving special rights to groups that may treat children inappropriately, indoctrinate them, and maybe disadvantage them when compared with children who are not members of those groups.

It is important to emphasize, however, that this is not to say that providing special rights to minority groups entails that children, women and gays, lesbians and bisexuals will be disadvantaged. Many postcolonial philosophers, like Mookherjee (2005), have contended that even though there may be worries about internal oppression, sometimes these worries are misplaced. Routinely, members of minority cultures see value in their cultural practices and wish to endorse them, despite the fact that these practices may look oppressive for outsiders. Furthermore, sometimes practices may seem illiberal to an outsider, but because their social meaning differs from the one given by the outsider, the practice is not illiberal (Horton, 2003).

4. Animals and Multiculturalism

Another topic that has not been explored very much is how multicultural policies can have perverse effects on non-human sentient animals. If a thin conception of non-human sentient animals’ interests is endorsed, it can be understood how animals’ interests may be violated by multicultural policies. Assume that animals have three kinds of interests. First, they have the interest in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them (Casal, 2003; Cochrane, 2007). Second, non-human sentient animals have an interest in some degree of negative freedom: they have an interest in not being physically restricted in cages or forced to undertake hard labor. Third, non-human sentient animals have an interest in having access to resources for their well-being; in particular, non-human sentient animals have an interest in receiving veterinary care and in not being malnourished or denied food. With this modest assumption that animals have an interest in not being treated with cruelty and instead wish to pursue a healthy life, some philosophers have contended that animals’ interests are at risk when giving special rights to groups. There are cultural groups which have practices that interfere with the interests of non-human sentient animals and in terms of multiculturalism these policies may give cultural groups powers that may facilitate animal cruelty. Some cultural groups engage in particular animal slaughtering practices because their religion imposes that meat is cut in a specific way before it is eaten. An example of how multicultural policies can be damaging for non-human sentient animals is if the exemption of minority groups from state laws on animal cruelty could lead to the facilitation of inflicting these harmful practices on animals. In particular, if those groups who practice certain types of animal slaughtering are exempt from animal cruelty laws, then this may facilitate the violation of animals’ interests in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them.

This topic raises also a problem of legitimacy. Most majority societies fail to treat animals with respect and do not usually protect the interests of non-human sentient animals. As a result, a philosophical question that may arise is whether intervention in the practices of minorities mistreat non-human sentient animals would be legitimate, given the fact that majorities themselves fail to treat animals with respect.

5. References and Further Reading

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  • Kukathas, C. (2003a). Responsibility for past injustice: how to shift the burden. Politics, Philosophy & Economics, 2(2), 165-190.
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  • Okin, S. M. (1999b). Reply. In J. Cohen, M. Howard, and M. C. Nussbaum, (Eds). Is multiculturalism bad for women? Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 115-132.
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Author Information

Luís Cordeiro Rodrigues
University of York
United Kingdom


Mulla Sadra (c. 1572—1640)

Mulla Sadra made major contributions to Islamic metaphysics and to Shi'i theology during the Safavid period (1501-1736) in Persia. He started his career in the context of a rising culture that combined elements from the Persian past with the newly institutionalized Shi'ism and Sufi teachings. Mulla Sadra was heir to a long tradition of Islamic philosophy that from the beginning had accommodated the speculations of Greek philosophers, especially Neoplatonic philosophers, for the purpose of understanding the world, particularly in relation to the creator and the Islamic faith. Islamic philosophy originated in the rational endeavours to reconcile reason and revelation though the results did not always satisfy theologians, but ironically widened the gaps between reason and revelation.

Mulla Sadra, too, was deeply concerned about both reason and revelation, and he tried a new way of reconciliation by openly employing a synthetic methodology in which mysticism played an important part. For him and his followers, human knowledge is tenable only as long as it goes back to the indirect grasp of reality which in itself is not subject to conceptualization.  Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra was dedicated to the traditional forms of logical arguments that are based on premises evident to the mind rather than on beliefs which come from religious faith and tradition. For example, his use of Qur'anic verses and religious ideas, though it is an important part of his system, is mainly confined to a secondary or supportive position. As for mysticism, the extensive use of mystical concepts and terminology is acceptable from the point of view of those thinkers who believe that mystical inspiration, intellectual intuition, and revelation, originate in one and the same source, hence their celebration of Mulla Sadra's work as "prophetic philosophy." As a result, the scope of Mulla Sadra's work is wider than his predecessors. In addition to metaphysics, he wrote extensively on the Qur'an and the Tradition and no other major philosopher before him had been so productive in the field of religion.

While focusing on Mulla Sadra's metaphysics including his ontology, epistemology, psychology, this article also brings to light the philosopher's solutions to theological problems. Owing to these solutions, not only did Islamic philosophy manage to survive against religious and political odds, but also Shi'i theology never lost its foothold on the intellectual ground. Although the organic unity of Mulla Sadra's system rests on all the various components of his thought, his independent works on exegesis, mystical treatises, and his commentaries on preceding philosophers, are outside the scope of this article.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Synthetic methodology
  3. Ontology
    1. Primacy of Being
    2. Gradation of Being
    3. The Absolute and the Relational
  4. Epistemology
    1. Mental Being
    2. Unity of the Knower and the Known
  5. Soteriological Psychology
    1. Substantial Motion and the Soul
    2. The End of the Human Soul
  6. Major Theological Issues
    1. The Essence and the Attributes
    2. Temporal Origin of the World
    3. Bodily Resurrection
    4. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood
  7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition
  8. Legacy
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Philosophical Works
    2. English Translation of Primary Literature
    3. Secondary Books in European Languages

1. Biography

Muhammad ibn Ibrahim ibn Yahya al-Qawami al-Shirazi, commonly known as Mulla Sadra, was born and grew up during the golden days of the Safavid period, Iran’s first Shi'ite dynasty (c. 1501-1736). As the only son of a noble family, he received both intellectual and financial support towards a good education that started in his home town, Shiraz, in southeastern Iran. Though Shiraz had a glorious past with regard to philosophy, in Mulla Sadra's day it was not the best place for satisfying his intellectual desire.  In his quest for advanced religious and philosophical training he left Shiraz for Qazvin and then moved to Isfahan where he studied with the most eminent intellectual figures of the day, Mir Damad (d. 1631) and Shaykh Baha'̓i (d. 1576) who were also affiliated with the court of the Safavid King, Shah Abbas I (c. 1587-1629). While Mulla Sadra's philosophical character evolved in conversation and debates with Mir Damad, he owed to Shayk Baha'i his broad knowledge of exegesis (tafsir), tradition (hadith), mysticism (irfan) and jurisprudence (fiqh).  There is yet no historical evidence that he ever studied with Mir Findiriski (d. 1640/1), the other leading intellectual of the time. However, the frequency of associating the two by scholars such as Henry Corbin (d. 1978) suggests an inclination on their part towards providing a perfect picture of the philosopher's integration in the intellectual life of Isfahan with all the pivotal thinkers involved in shaping what has been called "the full flowering of prophetic philosophy" in Mulla Sadra's hands (Nasr 2006).

In 1601, upon the death of his father, Mulla Sadra returned to Shiraz. Later he related his experience during the time spent in Shiraz in a doleful and critical voice denouncing the intellectual atmosphere of the city for being hostile, suppressive, and philistine with regard to philosophy (al-Asfar I 7). He decided to leave Shiraz for a life of solitude and contemplation in Kahak, a quiet village near the city of Qom. The peace and quiet of life in Kahak gave Mulla Sadra the opportunity to start the composition of his most foundational work, al-Hikmat al-muta 'aliya fi'l-asfar al-'aqliyya al-arba (Transcendent Wisdom in the Four Journeys of the Intellect). There he also found some of his life-long students who became well-known scholars of their own time.

This period was followed by several journeys between Shiraz, Isfahan, Qom, Kashan, and most importantly, seven pilgrimages to Mecca. Apparently, this itinerant stage played an important part in his intellectual and spiritual growth that is also suggested by the "journey" metaphor in the title and divisions of al-Asfar. It was also during this period that Mulla Sadra accepted the invitation to teach at Khan School, which was built in Shiraz on the order of the new governor, Allahwirdi Khan, in Mulla Sadra's honour and for the purpose of his lectures.

Mulla Sadra had a family of six children, three sons and three daughters. All his sons became scholars and his daughters were married to three of Sadra's students whom he treated as family even prior to the marriages. We know that two of these students Muhsin Fayz Kashani  (d. 1679/80 ) and Abd al-Razzaq Lahiji (d. 1661/2 ) succeeded their father-in-law as two influential figures of their time though different to him in their philosophical orientation and working under more pressure due to the growing antagonism to philosophy and mysticism under Shah Abbas II (c. 1642-1666).

The intellectual network consisting of Mulla Sadra, his teachers and students that was later dubbed "the School of Isfahan" was formed in a unique political and religious context. Philosophers such as Mir Damad and Mulla Sadra managed to get their voices heard by their contemporaries and posterities in spite of the conservative religiosity of the newly established Shi'ite rule partly owing to the religious and political state of affairs. Since the Safavids strove to establish their identity as a Persian-Shi'ite state in contrast to the Sunni caliphate of the Turks and Arabs, they were in need of philosophy as a stronghold of knowledge that could reinforce, not to say generate, power through systematic thought. At least during the formative and golden days of the Safavid period the attacks on philosophers targeted their Sufi leanings rather than their endeavours to reconcile metaphysics with Shi'ite theology.

A prolific writer, Mulla Sadra composed a large number of treatises on ontology, epistemology, cosmology, psychology, eschatology, theology, mysticism, the Quran and the Tradition. However, many of his philosophical and theological works are repetitions of or elaborations on chapters from his magnum opus al-Hikmat al-mutaliyah fi’l-asfar al-arba‘a al-‘aqliyyah, commonly referred to as al-Asfar that is printed in nine volumes. Rather than simply holding Mulla Sadra's theses, the latter work is an encyclopaedia of different schools of Islamic philosophy and theology. With the exception of Risala-yi si asl (Treatise on the Three Principles) which is in Persian, he wrote all his works in Arabic that was the lingua franca of the Muslim world at that time. He also wrote extensive commentaries on the Qur 'an and the tradition among which respectively al-Mafatihal-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible) and his voluminous commentary on the famous collection of Shi'ite tradition, Usul al-kafi by Kulayni (d.939) are the most important.

After a pious life of dedication to acquiring and expanding philosophy and Islamic sciences, Mulla Sadra died in Basra on the way to his seventh pilgrimage to Mecca. His death was once believed to have occurred in 1640 with his body being buried in Basra. However,  modern scholarship offers new evidence, though not conclusive evidence, in support of the date of 1645 and his burial being in Najaf (Rizvi 2007 30).

2. Synthetic methodology

Mulla Sadra was determined to construct a spacious house of "transcendental philosophy" that could accommodate the apparently conflicting paths in Islamic history towards the ultimate wisdom. He was also heir to a long tradition of philosophy in Persia which had adopted the methodology of Greek philosophy and interpreted it not only in accordance with the Islamic faith, but also implicitly and partly in continuation of the antique Persian traditions. Similar to his past philosophical masters Ibn Sina (d. 1037) and Suhrawardi (d. 1191), but unaware of Ibn Rushd's (d.1198) criticism of Neoplatonism in Islamic philosophy, Mulla Sadra relied on Neoplatonic precepts which had been taken for Aristotelian ideas by preceding philosophers. In particular, he followed Suhrawardi by adopting a holistic method of philosophy in which reason is accompanied by intuition, and intellection is the realization of the quintessence of the human soul, with prophecy (nubuwwa) and sainthood (wilaya) as the noblest manifestations of it.  It is based on this holistic attitude that on the one hand, Mulla Sadra synthesizes the two main schools of Islamic philosophy, namely, the Peripatetic and Illuminationist schools, and on the other hand, bridges the gaps between philosophy, theology, and mysticism. While Mulla Sadra's philosophical methodology is rational in the sense of building his arguments on premises that consist in evident propositional beliefs, he does not reduce philosophical process to mere abstract logical reasoning. The pivotal place of intuition in his philosophical methodology is especially reflected by the influence of Ibn Arabi (d. 1240) throughout his works and by the fact that he regarded Ibn Arabi's writings as having a philosophical character with a "demonstrative force" (al-Asfar I 315). Whether we understand Mulla Sadra's use of intuition as "a higher form of reason" in the Platonic sense (Rahman 1975, 6), or as a prophetic experience that turns philosophy into "theosophy" (Nasr 1997, 57), in reality there is no actual separation between reason and intuition in Mulla Sadra's philosophy. Rather than considering ratiocination (that is, the process of exact thinking) and intuition as independent ways leading to different visions of the truth, for him they merge into one path complementing and completing each other.

Although no Islamic philosopher had ever announced reason and revelation, philosophy and prophecy in conflict with each other, in practice, several philosophical doctrines were regarded by theologians as blasphemous due to contradiction with the theological formulations of Quranic teachings. By synthesizing the findings of his predecessors and relying on his holistic methodology, Mulla Sadra addressed several controversial issues that had opened a wide gap between philosophy and theology, reason and faith. His conciliatory attitude is manifest in his writings that are replete with scriptural and theological references alongside and in harmony with the teachings of Ibn Sina, Suhrawardi, Ibn Arabi, and other Muslim thinkers.

3. Ontology

a. Primacy of Being

Although Aristotle identifies the external existence of a thing with its primary substance, he distinguishes between two questions we can ask with respect to everything: "What it is" and "whether it is (or exists)". This conceptual distinction was later extended to the extra-mental realm of contingent beings by Islamic philosophers, most insistently Ibn Sina, and following him scholastic philosophers such as Aquinas (d. 1274). For Ibn Sina, essence, or quiddity (mahiyya), is universal in the mind while particular in the external world once being is bestowed on it by the Necessary Being who is identified with the God of Abrahamic faith. Except for God who exists in His own right, every other being is composed of essence and being, hence contingent in the sense of dependence on the Necessary Being for their existence.

The distinction was taken for granted after Ibn Sina but turned into a controversial issue when philosophers in the Illuminationist school questioned the external reality of being over and above essence. Suhrawardi and following him Mir Damad argued that being was only a mental construct and the distinction between essence and being was only possible in the conceptual domain. Since then, Islamic philosophers have roughly been categorized as adherents of either the primacy of essence or the primacy of being. Influenced by his philosophy master, Mulla Sadra started as an advocate of essentialism but soon diverged towards the opposite doctrine that he made famous as "the primacy of being" (asalat-i wujud). He built on this foundation the whole of his philosophical system.

Starting with the concept of being, Mulla Sadra attributes two major characteristics to it. Firstly, being is beyond logical analysis, hence indefinable, due to its simplicity and supra-categorical status. It is self-evident and prior to any other concept in the mind. Secondly, it is a univocal concept in the sense that it has one and the same meaning in all its applications, whether we apply it to God or to any other entity. The first characteristic seems to place being as such totally outside the grasp of discursive thought. The second one leaves the philosopher with the hope that in case he finds an alternative path towards being, he will be able to bridge the ontological gap made by certain theologians between the Creator and the created.

As for the reality of being in the external world, Mulla Sadra not only follows Ibn Sina in considering being as a reality, but adheres to his other master, Ibn'Arabi in considering being as the only reality, the doctrine which is commonly referred to as "the unity of being" (wahdat al-wujud). Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra's ontological monism does not imply that essences are illusions, as it is held in radical forms of Sufism. For Mulla Sadra, though essences are not genuine in their existence, they still exist as delimitations of the Real Being that is the ground of all that exists. Using a poetic analogy, the indefinite Reality is a colorless light while essences are the colourful glasses through which the single light appears as diverse phenomena. Conceptual differentiation, without which thinking and speaking would be impossible, is owing to this semi-reality of essences. To sum up, while being is the principle of unity, essence or quiddity is the principle of difference.

Mulla Sadra has several arguments for the primacy of being and its unrivalled reality. The most comprehensive list of the arguments appears in his al-Mashair, a useful summary of his ontology, and several arguments are included in al-Asfar. For the premises of his arguments, Mulla Sadra relies on the classical understanding of essence as a universal without external effects within the mind. On this ground, the real horse can give you a ride while the universal horse in the mind is incapable of that because real particularity, external properties and real effects are owing to being and cannot be in the mind. In conclusion, being is the ground of reality, or better to say, reality itself, while essence only belongs to the conceptual realm and as Mulla Sadra put it "the term 'existent' is applied to essence only with respect to its relation to being [itself]" (al-Asfar VI 163).

b. Gradation of Being

The univocal concept of being applies to its instances in the same sense because of the unity of its reality, and conceptual differences are only due to essences. On the other hand, essences have no reality of their own. Based on these two premises, one could conclude that diversity is not real. Gradation, or modulation, of being (tashkik al-wujud) is Mulla Sadra's way to avoid this counterintuitive result and to create a system in which the monistic worldview of Sufism is reconciled with the realistic pluralism of classical philosophy and our common sense. According to this doctrine, though one simple reality, being comes in grades, in a similar way that sunlight and candlelight are the same reality of different grades. In effect, there are only differences by degrees, while essences, as concepts in the mind, reflect gradations as contrasts. As Mulla Sadra put it,

The instances of being are different in terms of intensity and weakness as such, priority and posteriority as such; nobility and baseness as such, although the universal concepts applicable to it and abstracted from it, named quiddities, are in contrast essentially, in terms of genus, species, or accidents. (al-Asfar IX 186)

Before Mulla Sadra, Suhrawardi introduced the concept of gradation into the logic of definition and considered essence as capable of applying to instances by different degrees. For example, he regarded a horse more of an animal than a fly. His ontology was based on light as the hierarchical reality of universe with realms of existence as different ranks of it. Inspired by Suhrawardi's challenge of classical philosophers such as Ibn Sina who would not allow gradation in the same essence, but in contrast to the former's belief in the ontological primacy of essence or quiddity, Mulla Sadra replaced the hierarchical light of Suhrawardi with the hierarchical being. Accordingly, Reality is one and the same thing but possessed of different degrees of intensity, which justifies diversity within unity.

The doctrine of gradation not only supports the reality of diversity, but also points out the all-encompassing simplicity of being qua being. Hence the famous dictum that is frequently repeated in Mulla Sadra's works, "the Simple Reality (basit al-haqiqa) is all things but none of those things in particular" (al-Asfar VI 111).

c. The Absolute and the Relational

Given that for Mulla Sadra reality consists in different grades of the same being, the nature of causality becomes an urgent question for him. Mulla Sadra's formulation of causality reveals the strong influence of Ibn Arabi's unity of being (wahdat al-wujud). Mulla Sadra begins with causality in the sense of existentiation (ijad) according to which contingent essences are brought into existence once their existence is necessitated by the Necessary Being. However, since in Mulla Sadra's system, essences only belong in the conceptual domain, the relationship between cause and effect cannot be explained based on the metaphysical duality of being/essence. Therefore, he finally replaces this duality by the distinction he makes between two senses of being, the independent and the relational. At the cosmic level, the only independent being is the Absolute Being, while the rest, no matter of what intensity, are only relational.

Mulla Sadra's introduction of this distinction into Islamic philosophy was inspired by the linguistic division between the meaning of "to be" in the sense of existence as a real predicate, and "to be" as a copula, the latter being nonexistent as a word in Arabic and only suggested though predication. Relational being is a "being-in-another" in the sense of being nothing other than a relation to another being. For example, in saying that "snow is white", the predicative relation that is expressed by "is" has no existence apart from "snow" and "white". Mulla Sadra regards all beings as nothing but an existential relation to the Absolute Being. For Him, "He is the Truth and the rest are His manifestations. He is the Light and the rest are the streaks of that Light…" (al-Masha’ir 450).

4. Epistemology

Mulla Sadra's epistemology is not prior to but based on his findings about the nature of reality. Though this may sound like begging the question from the perspective of modern philosophy, it is consistent with the totality of Mulla Sadra's system in which everything including knowledge itself is a form of being. It is for this reason that he studies knowledge as a subject of first philosophy, namely, the study of being qua being. He diverges from what he criticises in Ibn Sina as the negative process of abstraction (al-Asfar III 287) in favour of the positive presence of noetic or mental beings in the mind. For Mulla Sadra, knowledge is the realization of an immaterial being which corresponds to the extra-mental reality because it is the higher grade of the latter being.

Mulla Sadra's main contribution to Islamic epistemology lies in his diversion from the Aristotelian dualism of subject and object, in other words, knower and the known (̒aqil wa ma'quil). He rejected the dominant theory of knowledge as the representation of the abstracted and universal form of particular objects to the mind. This innovation, though on a different ground and based on a different foundation, is comparable to the 20th century efforts made in the area of phenomenology and existentialism to get over the epistemological scepticism resulting from Cartesian dualism.

a. Mental Being

In classical Islamic epistemology knowledge is divided into "knowledge by presence" that consists only in the immediate access of the soul to itself in the sense of self-consciousness, and "knowledge by acquisition" that originates in sense perception and provides the subject with an abstracted representation of the external objects, that is, the intelligible universal at the level of intellect. In line with the Neoplatonic trend of thought adopted by Suhrawardi, Mulla Sadra replaced representation by direct presentation (hudur). For Mulla Sadra, all knowledge is, at bottom, knowledge by presence because our knowledge of the world is a direct access to what is called mental beings.

In contrast to the Peripatetic mental form or concept as a universal produced by abstraction, mental being is an immaterial and particular mode of existence with a higher intensity than the external object corresponding to it. According to Mulla Sadra, mental being is the key to the realization of all levels of knowledge including sense perception, imagination, and intellection. Upon encounter with the external world, the soul creates mental beings in a similar manner that God creates the world of substantial forms both material and immaterial (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 43). Thus, rather than correspondence between the external object and its represented form in the mind, for Mulla Sadra the credibility of knowledge lies in the existential unity of  different grades of the same being, one created by the soul and the other existing in the external world.

Although the human soul has the potentiality of creating modes of existence also in the absence of the matter, as in the case of miracles, for the average human soul, as long as she lives in the material world, contact with matter is necessary for activating the creative process of generating mental beings. In this respect, Mulla Sadra's epistemology should not be conflated with subjective idealism in that for him the physical being is a reality though of a lesser intensity than its counterpart in the soul.

b. Unity of the Knower and the Known

Mulla Sadra revolutionized epistemology with regard to the relationship between the knowing subject and her object based on the doctrine of the unity of the knower and the known previously held by the Neoplatonic Porphyry (d. 305) but strongly rejected by Ibn Sina.  Siding with the former, Mulla Sadra redefines the status of knowledge. Previously, mental form was defined as a psychic quality that occurs to the immaterial substance of the soul as a mere accident (̒arad), incapable of making any changes to the soul's essence. Conversely, for Mulla Sadra, knowledge that is made up of mental beings functions as a substantial form that actualizes the potential faculties of the soul. Similar to form and matter in the physical world, there is no real separation between the knower (soul or mind) and the immediately known object of it, that is, the mental being. To put it in a nutshell, knowledge is a single reality that, in its potentiality, is called "the knower" ('lim) or "the intellect" ('aqil) while in its actuality, it is "the known" (ma'lum) or the "intelligible" (ma'quil). Owing to this unity, rather than being a fixed substratum for accidental mental forms, the mind in its reality is identical to the sum of all the mental beings that are realized in it. In other words, there is no such thing as an actual mind in the absence of knowledge.

This existential unification holds at all the levels of knowledge that is confined by Mulla Sadra to sense perception, imagination, and intellection. The faculty of sense perception is a potentiality of the soul that is unified with the perceptible forms (or beings) in the occasion of contact with the sensible world. Once sensible forms (beings) are realized, a higher grade of mental beings called "the imaginal beings" are actualized in unity with the imaginative faculty of the soul. The same unification holds at the level of intellection between the intelligible forms (beings) as the actual and the intellect as potential. From this level, the human soul is capable of acquiring higher degrees of knowledge that prepares her for the final unification with the Active Intellect that is the reservoir of all knowledge, and as a result, the activator of the human mind during the creative process of knowledge formation. This epistemic elevation is at the same time the journey of the soul towards higher grades of being and spiritualization.

5. Soteriological Psychology

In the pre-modern context, one should understand the term "psychology" in the sense of inquiry into the nature and mechanism of the metaphysical soul in its relation to the body. Moreover, informed by the Islamic doctrines and inspired by mysticism, Islamic philosophers regarded the human soul as capable of elevation through acquiring knowledge and spiritual practice. Mulla Sadra's psychology is not an exception to this tradition; however, in his system, the human soul is given a more dominant role within the cosmic drama that unfolds along a salvific process of perfection.

a. Substantial Motion and the Soul

Mulla Sadra describes the soul as one simple but graded reality that in its unity includes diverse mental faculties. He also regards the soul as bodily in its origin, but spiritual in subsistence. This picture of the soul's substance is unprecedented in the philosophy before Mulla Sadra. It is built on the doctrine of substantial motion that is one of the hallmarks of transcendental philosophy. According to this doctrine, all nature, including substances and accidents, is in motion. As bodily in its origin, the soul too moves from one form to another as long as it is living in this world. The substance of the soul is an existentially graded reality in which the changes take place through the superimposition of one form over the previous one rather than one replacing the other. Therefore, the unity of the soul is maintained despite the changes and her identity is preserved.

Though starting from the Aristotelian view of the soul as the form of the body, in his psychology, Mulla Sadra departs from the former in attributing to the human soul the power of growing out of the bodily attachment. Along with the expansion of knowledge and spiritual evolvement, the soul moves up to higher grades of being. The rational human soul is actualized when we reach maturity (around the age of forty), but this is not the end. At this stage, we are actually human but potentially angels or devils. 

b. The End of the Human Soul

For Mulla Sadra, the ultimate happiness of the human souls is to join in the beatific life of the Intellects. This is in agreement not only with Aristotle's definition of happiness, but also with a Neoplatonic doctrine according to which the individual souls are only particular determinations of the universal soul that descends to the imperfect level of nature by joining the bodies. Therefore, the individual human soul, though starting as a bodily being in the world, is still invested with an otherworldly spirituality due to the noble state of the universal soul before the descent. The inherent inclination toward reunion with the Active Intellect, that is, the realm of Divine Knowledge, puts the soul back on the "arch of ascent". However, the ascent toward reunion is not guaranteed for each and every human soul since there are many phases that each soul should pass successfully in order to substantially evolve and reach up to higher ranks of being.

Mulla Sadra's delineation of the soul's journey resonates with ideas of Islamic mysticism which in turn is indebted for its theoretical formulation to Neoplatonic ideas. The title of his magnum opus, al-Asfar, together with its main divisions is a proof to the mystical attachment as the philosophical narrative unfolds in terms of the famous four journeys of the soul, namely, the quest in search of the ultimate Truth or God and the final reunion with Him. In al-Asfar, the first journey that is from the created to the Creator is devoted to the concept and reality of being. The second journey is from the Creator to the Creator through the Creator, and discusses essence. The third journey is from the Creator to the created with the Creator and is about God and His Attributes, and finally the journey from the created to the created with the Creator that is focused on the destiny of the humankind.

Furthermore, Mulla Sadra explains the afterlife of the human soul based on Ibn'Arabi's metaphysics of imagination that introduces the imaginal world (̒alam al-mithal) in between the Intellectual realm on top and the material world at the bottom. In line with Ibn'Arabi and Suhrawardi, while in contrast to Ibn Sina, Mulla Sadra believes in a bipartite reality of imagination according to which imaginative forms can exist both as subjective, or attached to the human mind, and as objective, or independent, comprising the detached domain of imagination, that is, the imaginal world. The creative imagination of the human soul, which is the source of prophecy and miracles in this world, is also the key to the bodily resurrection of the soul in the next world. While in this world only the prophets and saints are capable of bringing their imagination into life, in the next world where the material bodies are no more existent, every soul will be capable of creating her imaginal body.

The bodily resurrection of the soul should not be conflated with any forms of reincarnation which is strongly rejected by Mulla Sadra. He uses the analogy of "reflections in the mirror" (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya, 126) to show the necessary correlation between the otherworldly body and the spiritual grade of the individual soul. Rather than transmigrating into another body, the soul creates its very own body that becomes an objective image of her intentions and deeds in the previous life. That is the reason why the lesser souls will be resurrected as animals while the noble ones will simply join in the life of Intellect with no bodies at all. Thus, the hierarchy of resurrected souls in the next world corresponds to the hierarchy of souls in this world. There is a subtle problem here concerning the nature of imagination and the "mirror-like" nature of the soul in terms of eschatology. Mulla Sadra's use of mirror imagery with respect to other-worldly bodies is his response to Suhrawardi on the same issue and draws on the endeavours of Ibn'Arabi and his commentator Dawoud al-Qaysari (d. 1350) to solve an earlier problem in Islamic philosophy (Rustom 2007).

6. Major Theological Issues

Islamic philosophy is rooted in the early endeavours of Mu'tazilite theologians who borrowed the instrument of Greek logic and terminology in order to formulate the doctrines of faith in a manner palatable for human reason. Of primary importance was proof to the existence and oneness of God, the nature and function of His Attributes, and the nature and mechanism of prophecy. Not only have different schools of theology offered divergent solutions to theological problems, but also theology has been in conflict with philosophy over several key issues. One of the novelties of Mulla Sadra's work was the systematic effort to resolve long-held conflicts between philosophers and theologians. Moreover, unlike his philosophical predecessors, he did not leave any religious doctrine to mere faith and believed in the possibility of rational explanation for all. His proof for the doctrine of bodily resurrection is a good example of this positive attitude. On the whole, Mulla Sadra does not see a chasm between philosophy and theology; rather, his theology is both the continuation and the ultimate result of his philosophical doctrines.

Mulla Sadra dismissed all the previous proofs to the existence of God as resting on wrong assumptions, or at best insufficient. He even criticised Ibn Sina's "proof of the righteous" (al-Asfar VI 13) because of its reliance on the concept rather than the reality of being. However, Mulla Sadra's proof, which he calls by the same name, shares the a priori character of Ibn Sina's proof. An a priori proof (burhan-i limmi) does not infer the existence of the Creator (cause) from the existence of any particular created thing (effect). For Mulla Sadra, the "proof of the righteous" is called by this name because it has the privilege of arguing for the existence of God through God Himself. Based on Mulla Sadra's ontology, the reality of being is necessary, and it is of different grades. The delimited and imperfect grades do not exist in their own right, but only as relations to the most perfect or Absolute Being. Therefore, the Absolute Being or God must necessarily exist. Starting from the reality of being, this argument infers the existence of God from God Himself because "the real being and the Necessary Being apply to the same thing", that is, God (al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma'ad 30).

As for the oneness of God (tawhid), that is, the first article of faith in Islam, Mulla Sadra further relies on his ontological views to argue against both the intrinsic and extrinsic plurality with respect to God. His argument is based on the transcendental inclusiveness of the Absolute Being. God as the Absolute Being is a simple reality in the sense of being without parts while including all things. As the most intense and the only independent being, God is inclusive of every form of existence while excluding only the imperfections and contingencies. Therefore, to assume another being next to God would be logically absurd. In Mulla Sadra, the theological doctrine of Divine Oneness can be identified with the mystical-philosophical doctrine of the oneness of being that is the only way in which the oneness of God can be understood without wrongly imagining it as a numerical concept.

a. The Essence and the Attributes

The simplicity of the Absolute Being in the sense of being comprehensive of all is also the key to explaining God's Attributes in relation to each other and to the Essence (dhat). Though the Attributes must be infinite in number and scope, human beings only know of a limited number of them through the Qur'an. The nature of Divine Attributes has been a subject of controversies between different theological schools. They differ over the objectivity of the Attributes in the sense of independence from God's Essence. In al-Asfar and al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma 'ad, Mulla Sadra has elaborated on several Attributes including Life, Knowledge, Will, Speech, Vision and Hearing. He tries to prove the reality of the Attributes in a way that would not defy the unity of God's Essence. He resolves this theological paradox of diversity in unity with regard to God's Essence by resorting to the simple reality of God's Being. In a similar way to the unity of the soul with the diverse psychic properties like knowledge and will, all the Attributes of God are not only unified with the Essence, but unified with each other. The corollary to this conclusion is that, in its ontological unity with the infinite and necessary Reality of God, each Attribute must be infinite and necessary. For example, God has necessary and infinite knowledge of all. According to Mulla Sadra, God knows the world through the knowledge of Himself and as his Essence includes all, he has knowledge of all without any limits. Nevertheless, the objects of divine knowledge exist at the level of Essence in a state of existential togetherness (wujud al-jam'i) with a higher grade of being than their existence as distinct essences in the created world. This is the way Mulla Sadra tried to resolve a long-held conflict between philosophy and theology regarding God's detailed knowledge of the world. In a similar fashion, Mulla Sadra redefines other Attributes of God in the context of transcendental philosophy with the hope of reconciling philosophy with theology.

b. Temporal Origin of the World

One of the earliest and harshest theological indictments of Islamic philosophy was carried out by the Ash'arite theologian, Abu Hamid Muhammad ibn Muhammad al-Ghazzali, (d. 1111) in his al-Tahafat al-falasifa (The Inconsistency of Philosophers). One of the most important faults he finds in philosophers such as Ibn Sina is the doctrine of the eternity of creation. According to this doctrine that was accepted by all Peripatetic philosophers the universe was created in eternity, which means that creation had no beginning in time. This doctrine has been criticised by theologians due to its conflict with the scriptural picture of creation, both in the Bible and the Qur'an.

Mulla Sadra takes a middle path between reason and revelation by resorting to his doctrine of substantial motion. According to Mulla Sadra, every particle of nature is in constant motion along their timeline which he regards as the fourth dimension of the bodily substance. Motion is not an accidental property given to nature over and above its substance; rather, it is essential to it and caused at the same 'time' with the creation of the bodily substance. Motion is by definition temporal, and substantial motion is the renewal of every particle of nature in time. Thus, Mulla Sadra concludes that every particle of nature is being recreated at every moment, which is the meaning of temporal origination. The world as a whole is nothing more than its parts, so the origination of the whole world in time is an absurd question.

c. Bodily Resurrection

Bodily resurrection is an article of Islamic faith that is regarded by theologians as a requisite for the fulfilment of the scriptural promises and threats regarding reward and punishment in the next world. As a theological issue, bodily resurrection has caused serious conflicts between philosophy and theology particularly following Ghazzali's criticism of Ibn Sina on this issue. According to Ibn Sina, bodily resurrection is a matter of faith that Muslims must believe in, but from a logical point of view, it is impossible.

Mulla Sadra follows Ghazzali in holding that scepticism over bodily resurrection is not acceptable from either the religious or logical point of view (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya 125). However, he reinterprets bodily resurrection in terms of the imaginative creation of the otherworldly body by the soul. Though immaterial, the imaginal body is possessed of the three dimensions of the physical body that make it subject to a variety of feelings similar to our dream-world experiences. This will especially serve the purpose of punishment for the imperfect souls who spoiled the prospect of an intellectual/heavenly life through their carnal obsessions in the previous world. Some souls may be pardoned after serving their time in Hell by God's Grace and the intermission of angels and nobler souls. As for the others, they will stay in Hell with their imaginal bodies forever. Despite his efforts, Mulla Sadra's picture of resurrection is not in complete conformity with that of theology. Especially, his intellectual Paradise is not different to that of the classical philosophers. Great souls are not satisfied with carnal pleasures even in this world, so their reward in the next world cannot be a carnal one.

d. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood

Influenced by Ibn 'Arabi's doctrine of "the Perfect Human" and its incorporation into Shi'i imamate by Sayyid Haydar Amuli  (d. 1385), Mulla Sadra explains prophethood, imamate, and sainthood as related aspects of the same reality. Prophets, Imams, and Saints are instances of the category of the Perfect Human (al-insan al-kamil) whose soul is inclusive of the three levels of creation, that is, the intellectual, the imaginal, and the sensory worlds. Mulla Sadra, regards prophethood as "exoteric guidance" (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 492) which is necessary for the average people. Intellectual truths that are revealed to prophets through the unification of their intellect with the Angel of revelation, identical to the Active Intellect of philosophy, descend to the level of imagination and sense perception in order to be communicated to the people.

The esoteric side of prophecy is not only the innermost spiritual meaning of it, but also the purpose of creation. Although Muslims believe that Muhammad was the last prophet of God, according to Mulla Sadra, after the death of Muhammad, revelation continued in the form of inspiration that endows the Imam and Saint with the same infallibility as the Prophet.  Thus, the content of the divine communication is the same in all three, but the form is slightly different. Prophets have a clearer vision of the Angel of revelation in comparison to the Imams and Saints (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 480).

7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition

In many cases philosophers have resorted to the Qur’an in order to reinforce their philosophical arguments. On the other hand, there is a long tradition of Qur'anic exegesis ranging from technical linguistic analysis to rational and esoteric hermeneutics (ta'wῑl) that comprises a sophisticated and independent discipline. Mulla Sadra is a special case as a philosopher who has dedicated independent treatises to Qur'anic commentaries. Moreover, there is a mutual reinforcement between his philosophy and his reading of the Qur'an in the sense that not only his approach to the Qur'an is philosophical, but also his philosophy has a Qur’anic base (Rustom 2012). Mulla Sadra does not see any conflicts between the teachings of the Qur'an and his philosophical system. Apart from several commentaries on chapters and verses from the Qur'an, Mulla Sadra also wrote about the theoretical and practical criteria of exegesis. His major theoretical work is Mafatih al-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible).

As for Mulla Sadra's work on the tradition (hadith), his monumental commentary on al-Usul al-kafi by Kulayni  is the most important. Kulayni's work is the first Shi‘i collection of Hadith and focuses on theology and jurisprudence. It has served as a textbook at the religious seminaries around the Shi'i world for centuries, and Mulla Sadra's commentary on this work has secured him a good place among the experts in Hadith scholarship.

8. Legacy

Mulla Sadra's influence on his immediate students, including his sons-in-law, Fayz Kashani and Lahiji, owed more to the mystical aspect of his works. As for his philosophical doctrines, he was only followed by the less famous among his students such as Husayn Tunikabuni  (d.1693). Especially, in the late Safavid period due to the intellectually suppressive atmosphere created by influential clerics, most prominently Muhammad Baqir Majlisi (d. 1198), philosophical and particularly mystical thoughts were antagonized by the ruling system and the clerics alike.

Nevertheless, the legacy of the philosopher was kept alive until, in the Qajar period (c. 1785-1925), a more welcoming attitude facilitated the revival of his works in the hands of his followers who worked as Sadrian scholars. In addition to editing and expounding the latter's works, as teachers they also initiated a chain of scholars that has continued until today. Among contemporary scholars and Sadrian philosophers, Muhammad Husayn Tabataba'i (d. 1981) is one of the most widely read. His books, which are based on Mulla Sadra's philosophy with some modifications, are still being taught as compendiums of Islamic philosophy at the departments of philosophy in Iran. Mulla Sadra studies particularly flourished after the Islamic Revolution of 1979. Since then, he has been widely taught both at the religious seminaries and universities with governmental funds supporting the foundation of institutes and international conferences. Among these, Sadra Islamic Philosophy Research Institute, established in 1994 in Tehran, and the World Congress on Mulla Sadra in 1999 are the best examples.

After Mulla Sadra’s death, India was the first place outside Iran to show his influence. A remarkable number of expositions and commentaries have been written on one of his marginal works called Commentary on Sharh al-Hidayah in India where it has been taught as a course book of Islamic philosophy for several centuries. Later, the Shi'i seminaries of Iraq in the city of Najaf and some influential thinkers in Pakistan also welcomed Mulla Sadra's philosophy.

Mulla Sadra was introduced into the West at the end of the nineteenth century by the German orientalist, Max Horten (d. 1945) with an emphasis on the mystical aspect of the philosopher's work. Later during 1960's and 70's, the collaboration of the French scholar Henry Corbin (d. 1978) with Toshihiko Izutsu (d.1986 ) from Japan and Seyyed Hossein Nasr (b. 1933) from Iran, led to a full-fledged introduction of Mulla Sadra into Western academia as part of a wider project of reviving "perennial wisdom". Following their work, Mulla Sadra has been translated, taught, and discussed in academic journals and circles both in Europe and North America. The contemporary generation of Mulla Sadra scholars, though approaching Mulla Sadra from different points of view, are illuminating various aspects of the philosopher's work.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Philosophical Works

  • Mulla Sadra, Risala-yi si asl. Seyyed Hossein Nasr (ed.). (Tehran: Mulla Sadra Research Institute, 1381AH solar).  
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-muta'aliya fi asfar al-aqliya al-arba'a. 5. Muhammad Reza Muzaffar (ed.). 9 vols. (Beirut: Dar al-ihya ' al-turath al-Arabi, 1999).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-'Arshiyya. Ghulam Ahani (ed.). (Isfahan: Isfahan University press, 1340 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh al-Hidaya.Ahmad Shirazi (ed.). (Facsimile repr. Qom: Intishsrat-i Bidar. 1313 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mabda' wa'l-ma'ad. Ahmad Hosseini Ardakani (ed.). (Tehran: Sitad-i Inqilab-i Farhangi, Markaz-i Nashr-i Danishgahi, 1983).
  • Mulla Sadra, Tafsir al-Qur’an al-karim. M. Khajavi (ed.). 7 vols. (Qom: Intisharat-i Bidar, 1988).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya. 3. Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1387 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Shawahid al-rububiyya. Javad Mosleh (trans.). (Tehran: Soroush Press, 2006).
  • Mulla Sadra, Majmu'a-yi rasa'il-i falsafi-yi Sadr al-muta'allihin. Hamid Naji Isfahani (ed.). (Tehran: Hikmat, 1385AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Masha'ir.Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1386 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Mafatih al-ghayb. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). (Beirut: Mu 'assasat al-Tarikh al-Arabi, 2002 rpt).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh-i Usul al-Kafi. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). 4 vols. (Tehran: Pizhuhishgah-i Ulūm-i Insani va Mutala'at-i Farhangi, 2004).

b. English Translation of Primary Literature

  • Mahdi Dasht Bozorgi and Fazel Asadi Amjad, Divine Manifestations: Concerning the Secrets of the Sciences of Perfection (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • William Chittick, The Elixir of the Gnostics (Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2003).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • T. Kirmani, The Manner of the Creation of Actions (Tehran: SIPRIn, 2004).
  • J. Lameer, Conception and Belief in Sadr al-Din Shirazi (Tehran: Iranian Academy of Philosophy, 2005).
  • Parviz Morewedge, The Metaphysics of Mulla Sadra: The Book of Metaphysical Prehensions (New York: Society for the Study of Islamic Philosophy and Science, 1992).
  • James Morris, The Wisdom of the Throne (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1981).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr and Ibrahim Kalin, Metaphysical Penetrations: A Parallel English-Arabic Text by Mulla Sadra (Provo: Brigham Young Press, 2013).
  • Latimah Peerwani, On the Hermeneutics of the Light Verse of the Qur 'an (London: ICAS Press, 2004).
  • Colin Turner, Challenging Islamic Fundamentalism: The Three Principles of Mulla Sadra (London: Routledge, 2011).

c. Secondary Books in European Languages

  • Alparslan Açikgenç, Being and Existence in Sadra and Heidegger: A Comparative Ontology (Kuala Lumpur: International Institute of Islamic Thought and Civilization, 1993).
  • Reza Akbarian, The Fundamentals of Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Reza Akbarian, Islamic Philosophy: Mulla Sadra and the Quest of “Being” (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Cécile Bonmariage, Le Réel et les réalités: Mulla Sadra Shirazi et la structure de la réalité (Paris: Vrin, 2008).
  • Maria Massi Dakake,"Hierarchies of Knowing in Mulla Sadra's Commentary on Usul al-Kafi." Journal of Islamic Philosophy 6 (2010).
  • Mahdi Dehbashi, Transubstantial Motion and the Natural World (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Max Horten, Das philosophische System von Schirázi (Strasbourg: Trübner, 1913).
  • Christian Jambet, The Act of Being: The Philosophy of Revelation in Mulla Sadra. Jeff Fort (trans.). (New York: Zone Books, 2006).
  • Christian Jambet, Mort et résurrection en islam: L’audelàselon Mulla Sadra (Paris: Albin Michel, 2008).
  • Christian Jambet, Se rendre immortel (Saint Clémentde Rivière: Fata Morgana, 2002).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal. From Essence to Being: The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra and Martin Heidegger (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal, Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006).
  • Sayeh Meisami, Mulla Sadra (Oxford: Oneworld, 2013).
  • Mahmoud Khatami, From a Sadrean POint of View: Toward an Ontetic Elimination of the Subjectivistic Self (London: London Academy of Iranian Studies, 2004).
  • Megawati Moris, Mulla Sadra’s Doctrine of the Primacy of Existence ( KualaLumpur: ISTAC, 2003).
  • Zailan Moris, Revelation, Intellectual Intuition and Reason in the Philosophy of Mulla Sadra: An Analysis of the al-Hikmahal‘Arshiyyah (London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2002).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr, Sadr al-Din Shirazi and His Transcendent Theosophy. 2nd ed. (Tehran: Institute for Humanities and Cultural Studies, 1997).
  • Fazlur Rahman, The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1975).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra Shirazi: His Life and Works and the Sources for Safavid Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra and Metaphysics: Modulation of Being (London: Routledge, 2009).
  • Mohammed Rustom, "Psychology, Eschatology, Imagination, in Mulla Sadra Shirazi's Commentary on the Hadith of Awakening," Islam & Science, vol 5 (summer 2007) No 1.
  • Mohammed Rustom, The Triumph of Mercy: Philosophy and Scripture in Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2012).
  • Mahdi Ha'iri Yazdi, The Principles of Epistemology in Islamic Philosophy: Knowledge by Presence (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992).


Author Information

Sayeh Meisami
Queen’s University School of Religion

Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang)

Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang, 1877-1969)

Zhang JunmaiZhang Junmai (Chang Chun-mai, 1877-1969), also known as Carsun Chang, was an important twentieth-century Chinese thinker and a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Zhang’s participation in “The Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923, in which he defended his Neo-Confucian views against those of Chinese progressives and scientists, made a strong philosophical impression on an entire generation of Chinese intellectuals by championing the value of traditional Confucian truth claims and asserting the limits of scientific knowledge.  Subsequently, Zhang’s two-volume study of The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought (1957) and his Manifesto for the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958) cemented his identification with Confucianism, and the view of Confucianism as compatible with modernity, in the English-speaking philosophical world. Despite his association with Confucianism, Zhang was deeply influenced by the work of the French thinker Henri Bergson and exponents of German Idealism, particularly Immanuel Kant and Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel. Zhang is best known today, however, not for his original philosophical work but rather for his political activities during China’s Republican era (1912-1949), through which he and his “Third Force” party attempted to mediate between the polarized Nationalist and Communist factions in the Chinese political landscape, as well as his promotion of Neo-Confucian studies in the West. His personal motto was, “Do not forget philosophy because of politics, and do not forget politics because of philosophy.” Due perhaps to his acknowledgment of Western influences as well as his involvement in politics, Zhang remains one of the modern Confucian movement’s most understudied figures, especially in comparison to his contemporaries Feng Youlan and Mou Zongsan. Yet his dual participation in both philosophy and politics makes him an exemplary Confucian and an embodiment of the Neo-Confucian ideal of “the unity of knowledge and action” (zhixing heyi).

Table of Contents

  1. Early Life
  2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity
  5. Influence and Key Interpreters
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Studies

1. Early Life

The man known as Zhang Junmai was born Zhang Jiasen, son of a merchant family in the Jiading district of China’s Jiangsu Province, on January 18, 1887. His early education included the memorization of the Four Books and Five Classics of traditional Confucianism.  At the age of eleven, however, his forward-thinking family sent him to study Western history and science as well as the English language, although he continued to read the work of influential Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Zhu Xi. At the age of fifteen, he passed the district-level civil service examination and earned the basic shengyuan or xiucai degree, which entitled its bearers to exemption from corvée labor and corporal punishments and granted them access to local government facilities.  After continuing his studies for a few more years, Zhang taught English in Hunan Province for two years before traveling to Tōkyō, Japan in 1906 and enrolling in Waseda University’s undergraduate program in economics and political science. Like many other Chinese intellectuals of that era, he intended to take advantage of Japan’s recent and rapid modernization by studying Western thought while remaining within an East Asian cultural context.

In Japan, Zhang befriended the constitutional monarchist Liang Qichao (1873-1929), a political reformer whose activities led to his exile in 1898.  Zhang began to publish articles in Liang’s biweekly, New Citizen (Xinmin Congbao), including translations of excerpts from John Stuart Mill’s Considerations on Representative Government. Zhang’s other activities within expatriate Chinese circles included participation in the creation of the Political Information Society (Zhengwen she), which competed with Sun Yat-sen’s United League (Tongmeng hui) for the hearts and minds of reform-minded Chinese of the period. After graduating from Waseda in 1911, he returned to China and successfully passed the entrance examination for the Hanlin Academy, a prestigious Confucian college founded in the eighth century. However, the Hanlin Academy, like other official Confucian institutions, soon fell victim to the Chinese Revolution, which swept away this and other vestiges of imperial rule in favor of a more democratic and scientifically-minded “New China.” Unable to pursue his dream of becoming a government official, Zhang returned to his ancestral home, where he was appointed chairman of the local parliament. Soon afterward, Zhang’s publication of an article critical of government policy toward Mongolia led to his proscription, and he fled to Germany to avoid repression.

In Germany, as in Japan, Zhang once more pursued academic studies, registering at the University of Berlin for preparatory coursework that would lead to enrollment in the University’s doctoral program in law and political science. World events disrupted his plans yet again when the First World War broke out in 1914. Zhang turned his attention to the ongoing conflict, publishing articles in about the European political and military situations in Chinese newspapers. In 1915, Zhang traveled to England before returning to China one year later to assume the editorship of the newspaper New Current Affairs (Shishi xinbao) and teach law at Beijing University. With the conclusion of hostilities in 1919, Zhang toured Europe in the company of Liang Qichao and other Chinese intellectuals and attempted to intervene in the transfer of sovereignty over China’s Shandong Province (the home region of Confucius) from Germany to Japan by the Peace Conference of Versailles that ended the war. Having recently produced a Chinese translation of the American president Woodrow Wilson’s “Fourteen Points,” which justified the Allies’ use of force in the name of democracy and national self-determination, Zhang was devastated and rapidly lost interest in politics, turning his attention “from social sciences to philosophy,” as he later called this crucial transition in his life.

In January 1921, Zhang met with Rudolf Eucken (1846–1926) in Jena, Germany. This encounter was perhaps one of the most important turning points in Zhang’s life. After a brief interview, Zhang decided to stay in Jena to learn philosophy under Eucken’s patronage. Studying with Eucken opened Zhang’s mind to new sets of ideas, especially those of Henri Bergson (1859-1941), and questions of life, ethics and culture gained a more important place in his thought. In 1922, Zhang collaborated with Eucken in the writing of a book in German entitled Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa (The Problem of Human Life in China and Europe). The first half of the book, written by Eucken, was a short introduction to the history of European conceptions of life, while the second half, written by Zhang, dealt with the outlooks on life found in the work of major Chinese philosophers. Although Zhang’s treatment of Chinese thought was mainly historical in perspective, this text marks the first occasion on which he drew parallels between Confucian traditions and the philosophy of Kant. Here, Zhang argued that Confucius’ dictum that “what the superior man seeks is in himself, while what the petty man seeks is in others” (Analects 15:21) was comparable to Kant’s claim that the sources of morality are to be found within oneself. Thus, in Zhang’s view, both Confucianism and Kantianism see human morality as grounded in human nature and thus autonomous.

Despite Zhang’s immersion in philosophical studies, he remained active in politics. During his time in Germany, he met with many activists and leaders, including the social democrat Philip Scheidemann (1865–1939) and the architect of Germany’s post-war constitution, Hugo Preuss (1860–1925). These encounters with Weimar Republic intellectuals helped to form Zhang’s conceptions of socialism and exerted a lasting influence on his dual life in politics and philosophy. Both aspects of this dual life were expressed in his participation in “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923.

2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics

Having returned to China, in February 1923 Zhang gave a speech at Beijing’s Qinghua School (later Qinghua University) about the differences between science and what he called “outlooks on life” (rensheng guan). In this speech, Zhang claimed that the former is characterized by “objectivity,” “logic,” “analytic methods,” “causality,” and “uniform phenomena,” while the latter are “subjective,” “intuitive,” and “synthetic,” based on “free will.” Moreover, he defended the idea that, in her path to modernization, China should not only consider the sciences but also ought to define a new way, based on the “outlooks on life” of ancient Chinese sages. Zhang’s position drew considerable criticism from intellectuals associated with the anti-traditional May Fourth Movement, especially the famous geologist Ding Wenjiang (1887–1936). The difference of opinion between Zhang and Ding developed into a major political and philosophical event in the intellectual history of Republican China and became known as “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists.” This debate played an important role in the emergence of a neo-conservative trend in modern Chinese thought by raising the questions of what place science ought to have in modern Chinese society and whether scientism and positivism ought to influence modern Chinese worldviews.  The debate also played an important role in the development of Zhang’s philosophy insofar as it prompted the first publication of Zhang’s philosophical views in Chinese.

By 1923, Zhang’s conception of himself as a “realist idealist” (weishi de weixin zhuyi)—one who refused to sacrifice empirical issues for the sake of his deeply-held ideals—was fully established. Because of Zhang’s attraction to the thought of Bergson and Eucken, he was often criticized as an “anti-rationalist” (fan lixing zhuyi zhe). What his critics appear to have had in mind was not an opposition to reason on Zhang’s part, but rather his concern to avoid the over-use of the “process of abstraction” (chouxiang licheng). On Zhang’s view, when considering abstractions such as “Humanity” or “Nature,” one should always keep in mind that they are real and in front of us. Instead of building abstract systems and concepts, Zhang wanted to construct a philosophy that would embrace the reality and the fullness of the universe.

Zhang founded his “realist idealist” philosophy on the basis of a classically dualistic conception of the world. On the one hand, there is matter (wuzhi or wu); on the other hand, there is spirit (jingshen) or mind (xin). Zhang rejected monistic conceptions of the world as incoherent, going so far as to translate the English philosopher C. E. M. Joad’s Mind and Matter, which advocated the same position, in 1926. Zhang’s dichotomy between mind and matter is a structural division in his philosophy, which generates a series of opposing notions: matter is outside (wai) of the self and is fixed (ding), while mind or spirit is always inside (nei) the self and in motion (dong). The material world of nature is governed by causality, while the spiritual world of humanity is conducted by free will (ziyou yizhi). In later years, when discussing the relation between liberty (ziyou) and power (quanli) in political philosophy, Zhang categorized the former as belonging to the realm of spirit and the latter as relative to matter. His division between science and “outlooks on life” thus is an extension of these binary oppositions that are basic to his thought.

Zhang regarded science (kexue) as a plural signifier and subdivided it into two types: “material sciences” (wuzhi kexue) and “spiritual sciences” (jingshen kexue). This opposition was based on the German distinction between “natural sciences” (Naturwissenschaften or Exactewissenchaften) and “spiritual sciences” (Geistwissenchaften). While his opponents advocated science as one universal epistemology based on specific methodology, Zhang argued that one should consider sciences according to their objects, which could be any of three types: “inert” (si zhi wu), “alive” (huo zhi wu), or “alive and thinking” (youhuo yousi zhi wu). Incapable of moving by themselves, inert objects are bound to follow the rules of causality. Their movements can be explained by natural laws, and it is the purpose of material sciences to discover and analyze these laws. For instance, astronomy aims at explaining how planets gravitate around the sun. On Zhang’s account, physics and astronomy are the most archetypal material sciences.

Although plants and animals lack “mind” in Zhang’s sense, they are alive nonetheless, so for Zhang, their analysis raises further issues.  Unlike inert objects, plants and animals can move on their own, so despite the fact that causality applies to them, it doesn’t explain everything. But Zhang insisted that the presence of life in itself couldn’t be questioned by science. Following the ideas of the German vitalist Hans Driesch (1867–1941)—who was at that time visiting in China, where Zhang served as his translator—Zhang seems to believe that there is an entelechy, a driving principle that directs life and its development without being part of the soul or the organism, the existence of which precludes questioning its manifestation. To Zhang, the very foundations of life were completely impossible to analyze. Therefore, biology was not literally “the science of what is alive” but only the science that analyzes the material structure and development of living animals and plants

As for what Zhang called “spiritual sciences”—by which he meant something like social sciences—these moved beyond the realm of matter and were capable of analyzing humanity itself. Yet all the natural laws that could be found in those sciences were always linked to a material aspect of life. For instance, Zhang accepted that there were laws of development in economy; economy and society were at some point to follow specific patterns. But he insisted that these laws could only be found because there are material and fixed data to analyze. Economics, for example, deals with manufactured goods. On Zhang’s account, spiritual sciences could discover and analyze laws of nature only if their object was somehow linked to something material. Even if there are laws that condition the development of social phenomena, human beings still can use their minds and free will to modify the situation. For that reason, social laws or historical patterns can only be sought in the past.  Following Bergson, Zhang noted that the human spirit is in perpetual transformation (xin zhi wanbian): it is impossible to divide thought into fixed mental states, as our minds are always on the move (dong). Having no place to settle, no analysis can be made. Therefore, for Zhang, there cannot be any real psychology, but only physiology, a study of the relation between stimuli and the mind. According to Zhang, science cannot predict the future of humanity, which is why he rejected Marxism.

In contrast to such “sciences,” Zhang outlined his understanding of “outlooks on life” as a coherent alternative to claiming that everything could be understood and controlled by Science. In her fight for a new culture (xin wenhua), China was to cast away naturalism and positivism, and develop a new “outlook on life,” based on both Western modernity and the teachings of the ancient Chinese sages, that did not exclude or condemn metaphysics. Zhang even claimed that the introduction of Bergson’s and Eucken’s philosophies to China could give birth to “Neo-Song [Dynasty] Learning” (xin songxue 新宋學), just as the introduction of Buddhism to China had permitted the emergence of the original Neo-Confucianism of the Song dynasty (songxue).

In Eucken’s philosophy, humanity is a being at the frontier of matter and spirit, and is in a perpetual struggle to achieve a spiritual life that can overcome his material nature. By promoting metaphysics, Zhang wished to foster human spiritual life and dismiss a scientistic conception of the world that would bind human beings in the web of material causality.   Borrowing from Eucken’s Die Lebenschauungen der grossen denker (Outlooks on Life of the Great Thinkers, 1890), Zhang defined “outlook on life” as follows:

The observations, holds, hopes, and demands that I have toward the persons and the objects external to myself—that’s what I call an outlook on life. (Zhang 1981, p. 935)

Outlooks on life are not under the control of sciences. They find their source in the self (wo). Considering that “toward the world, man’s life is inner as spirit and outer as matter” (ibid.), outlooks on life are in fact what link our spiritual life with the material world. Even if people of the past can be models to follow (Zhang 1981, p. 913), everyone ought to develop his own outlook on life according to what his heart-mind (xin) tells him. That is what Zhang called the mandate of moral conscience (liangxin zhi ming). For Zhang as for other Confucians, the heart-mind is the center of the self; every moral thought and volition is generated from it. Having three principal functions, knowledge (zhi 智), emotions (qing 情) and will (zhi 志), it is what makes us human. In total opposition to the view defended by Hu Shi (1891-1962) at that time, Zhang argued that the difference between humans and animals is qualitative, not quantitative. The use of such concepts and terminology shows how deep the influence of Mencius’ and Wang Yangming’s moral thought on Zhang was. As a thinker who was steeped in Confucian tradition, Zhang considered human beings to be good by nature and wanted to promote Neo-Confucian metaphysics as a means to cultivate oneself (xiushen).

Finally, a word should be said about Zhang’s debt to Kant, which was the result of his lifelong infatuation with this eighteenth-century German thinker. Zhang’s epistemology was mainly drawn from Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason (1781); he considered Kant to be the man who “had succeeded in harmonizing British empiricism and German rationalism” (Zhang 1981, p. 949). For Zhang, knowledge is the result of an encounter between material sense information and the innate categories of the mind. Human beings have innate categories or “concepts of reason” (lixing zhi gainian) that enable them to understand, classify, and aggregate all of their sensations (ganjue). It is these concepts of reason that link sensations to meanings (yiyi). Later, Zhang suggested that knowledge, built up from the encounter of sensations and concepts of reason, is always internal to one’s mind. For instance, in 1957, he wrote that the Song dynasty Confucian thinker Ch’eng I’s statement ”Human nature is reason” [(xing ji li ye], “means nothing other than the rationalist doctrine that forms of thought exist a priori in the mind” (Chang 1957, p. 35). For Zhang, the key philosophical question was that of the relationship between a mind able of knowing (zhizhi zhi xin) and the myriad things (wanwu zhi you) or phenomenal universe, through which knowledge of all that exists, materially and spiritually, could be integrated. Assuming that the principle of mind (xin li) is universal, Zhang anticipated that the development of thought ought to be somehow similar in every culture. This argument would form the basis of his claim that a genuine Chinese modernity was possible.

3. Political Philosophy

Despite Zhang’s leap “from social sciences to philosophy,” he did not abandon political life.    On the contrary, he participated in the drafting of a new Chinese constitution and wrote

On the Meaning of Constitutions (1921).  He struggled to introduce socialism in China. Very much taken with the newly-established Weimar Republic in Germany, Zhang wished to establish a very similar political system in China. In 1923, he opened a “Political Institute” in the suburbs of Shanghai, the aim of which was to form a new political elite that would be able to shape the nation’s affairs in future years. Under its auspices, Chinese students were exposed to political philosophy, economics, sociology, and international relations as well as Zhang’s critiques of both the Chinese Communist Party and the Guomindang (Kuomintang, KMT) or Chinese Nationalist Party, which contended against each other for political and later military supremacy throughout the 1920s, ’30s, and ’40s. After the KMT occupation of Shanghai in 1927, Zhang was forced to close the Institute and ventured into underground political activities. With Li Huang (1895—1991), a leader of the Chinese Youth Party (Zhongguo qingnian dang), he illegally published a journal, The New Way (Xinlu), in which he proclaimed his political values:

 [D]emocratic government, opposition to both one-class and one-party dictatorships, freedom of speech and association, opposition to the denial of these basic human rights under the pretext of party or military rule, the opposition to party control of education, of judicial affairs, of civil servants, and the use of the army for personal or party purposes. (Chi, p. 141)

These points can be regarded as the key ideas of Zhang’s political thought at the time. In opposition to nationalist and communist conceptions of the political power in China, Zhang totally forbade the political parties to indoctrinate their members, to use military force or to practice dictatorial politics—all of which may have prevented Zhang’s own political parties from ever succeeding in the brutal political climate of China during the 1930s. Frustrated by chronic repression at the hands of the KMT, Zhang fled China once again and returned to Germany, where he obtained a position as Professor of Chinese Philosophy at the University of Jena through the assistance of Eucken’s former students. Eventually, he returned to China just before Japanese invasion of Manchuria in September 1931. In this politically-charged and highly unstable climate, Zhang assumed professorial duties in philosophy at Yanjing University in Beijing, teaching mostly about Hegel, before being ejected from his position as a result of his critical stance vis-a-vis the KMT government. Siding with the warlord Chen Jitang, the de facto ruler of Guangdong Province, Zhang again found work as a professor of philosophy, this time teaching Neo-Confucianism—first at Sun Yat-sen University and later at his own Learning Ocean Academy (Xuehai Shuyuan).

At this institution, which blended traditional Confucian education with what Zhang saw as the best of Western learning (humanities, social sciences, and physical education), he was able to put into practice what he had defended during the debate of 1923: an education that would place equal and shared emphasis on the humanities (especially metaphysics), the arts, sports, and of course the sciences. In 1939, Zhang opened another such school: the Institute of National Culture (Minzu Wenhua Xueyuan), the guiding documents of which stated:

The objectives of this academy are as follows: one, to achieve one’s personality; two, to temper and foster intelligence in order to contribute to the world scholarship; three, to deploy these activities, in which moral and knowledge are one, to participate grandly in the ordering of the world (or statecraft). (Zhang 1981, p. 1435)

To participate in the world, either as politicians or as scholars, students were first to develop their personality. For Zhang, such psychological development, along with physical ability and intellectual knowledge, were all necessary to become a full human being. Self-cultivation through education, in turn, was key to the development of Chinese democracy, which was Zhang’s primary political commitment. In his political philosophy, there is a very strong bond between the people and the idea of the State. Democracy should not be implemented from above, but rather it should arise from the heart-minds of citizens. Influenced by Confucian ethics, Zhang appears to have viewed democracy through the prism of the canonical Confucian text known as the Daxue (Great Learning), which states:

To bring the world at peace, one should first govern one’s State; to govern one’s State, one should first order one’s family; to order one’s family, one should first cultivate oneself.

Zhang believed that the Chinese people would permit the emergence of democracy as the result of their own self-cultivation. For him, the State was no longer understood as a simple technical term of political science. It was the realization of the spirit of a people, founded on the basis of law and morality. Borrowing the Hegelian idea that “State is the realization of the Spirit [or Reason]” (guojia zhe jingshen zhi shixian ye), Zhang linked the question of the State with a certain humanism and a valorization of Chinese culture. The emergence of a new political system was to be the result of a New Culture (xin wenhua), from which would emerge a new outlook on life. Unfortunately, Zhang’s academies never stayed open very long. The Ocean Learning Academy was active for only two years, while the Institute of National Culture was closed in 1942, after three years of operation.

4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity

As was the case with Zhang’s moral metaphysics and political philosophy, so also in his understanding of culture did Zhang cleave closely to his Confucian heritage. His philosophy of culture upheld a certain conservatism, according to which both Chinese cultural unity and Chinese social development could proceed organically from a shared basis in Neo-Confucian thought. In The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936), which can be regarded as a response to Liang Shuming’s Eastern and Western Cultures and Their Philosophies (1921), Zhang defended this view:

Spiritual freedom [jingshen ziyou] is the foundation of a national culture [minzu wenhua] and therefore it should be the central principle to direct the politics, the sciences and the arts of China from now on. (Zhang 2006b, p. 1)

Zhang argued that a culture is a spiritual entity that is created by, and evolved through, the free contributions of its people—not a static expression of an ahistorical will, as Liang claimed. The nation is in fact the group of persons that build a cultural unity and live together within it. The influence of the Western philosophers of history Oswald Spengler (1880-1936) and Arnold Toynbee (1889-1975) can be seen in Zhang’s view. Zhang understood European modernity to be the result of a threefold historical process, which consisted of (1) religious reform (zongjiao gaige), (2) scientific development (kexue fazhan), and (3) the emergence of democratic government (minzhu zhengzhi). The challenge for China, therefore, lay not with importing European modernity, but rather with completing its own historical process of development in evolutionary terms specific to Chinese culture.

Like many Chinese intellectuals of the early twentieth century, Zhang advocated the need for a “New Culture”; like his rival Liang, Zhang believed that Chinese culture would become the global culture of the future. However, Zhang believed that this “New Culture” would develop only in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the West, just as Neo-Confucianism had developed in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the introduction of Buddhism from India—an historical event to which Zhang repeatedly referred as a positive precedent for China’s ability to adapt to foreign systems of thought. As “the culture of harmony,” Chinese culture would find the middle way (zhezhong) between all global philosophical and cultural trends—but only if she initiated the first step in the threefold historical process by rediscovering and reviving the “Chinese national spirit” (Zhonghua minzu jingshen), which Zhang identified with Neo-Confucianism. After China revived the quintessence of her past culture—that is, Neo-Confucianism as interpreted by Zhang—she would be able to formulate a new outlook on life, which in turn would give birth to a new culture. From this new culture, a new political system and a new economic organization soon would follow.

However, unlike many Chinese intellectuals of the era who defended a racial conception of the nation, Zhang had no interest in the question of blood lineage. As he pointed out in The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936) and The Way to Establish the State (1938), one could not find any racial unity in China; since various “barbarian” invasions had produced a “blood mix” in the population, the blood of the Han ethnic majority was no longer “pure.”  Constructing a blood-based nationalism would be irrelevant and self-destructive, but constructing a culture-based nationalism was another matter:

I won’t dare say that in History there was such a thing as a pure blood Han nation, however I can attest that there is a Han Culture, which embodies the language spoken, the characters used, the calendar, the customs, the rites and so on. (Zhang 2006d, p. 9)

Zhang’s activity as a non-aligned political thinker was curtailed by the end of cooperation between the KMT and the Chinese Communist Party in 1941, and he was placed under house arrest because of his opposition to KMT policies. In 1944, he was released and traveled to the United States, where he attended the founding meeting of the United Stations. While in the United States, Zhang renewed his interest in constitutionalism and spent much of his time studying the American Constitution. After returning to China in 1946, he began to argue that a conception of human rights, or at least its seeds, could be found in the Chinese intellectual tradition, especially in the thought of Mencius. His work became the basis of the Constitution of the Republic of China adopted in 1946, which is still in effect in Taiwan today. The implementation of the Constitution failed to resolve China’s ongoing civil war, however, and with the triumph of Communist forces in 1949, Zhang fled to a life of exile in Hong Kong.

In Hong Kong, Zhang produced The Third Force in China and initiated the modern Chinese discourse on democracy’s roots in Chinese tradition. Having identified elements of democratic sensibilities in ancient Chinese texts, Zhang held out hope that the establishment of democracy in China still was possible despite the victory of Communism on the mainland.  He even suggested that the Enlightenment and the development of democratic ideas in the West during the eighteenth century were made possible due to the introduction of Confucian thought to Europe by Jesuit missionaries a century earlier. Thus, in Zhang’s view, Confucius and Mencius were the hidden sources of the West’s Enlightenment. Moreover, Zhang regarded Marxism as being in total opposition to the “Chinese outlook on life,” and anticipated the eventual decline of Communist ideology in China. In 1957 and 1962, he issued in English the two volumes of his magnum opus on the intellectual history of China, The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought, which opens with the following sentence:

China is the land of Confucianism. (Chang 1957, p.15)

In Zhang’s biographically-focused and comparatively-oriented account of Neo-Confucianism, rooted in his conception of “outlooks on life” in the East and the West, he criticized Communism as an alien system of thought that would not take root in Chinese culture, which he believed was characterized by Confucianism despite the influence of other traditions. Identifying himself as a twentieth century “Neo-Confucian,” Zhang continued to advocate what he saw as a genuine Chinese Confucian modernity until his death at age eighty-two in the United States in 1969, which also marked the height of the Communists’ “Cultural Revolution” campaign against Confucianism and other emblems of Chinese tradition.

5. Influence and Key Interpreters

Zhang’s involvement in the production of A Manifesto on the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958), a document that aimed to promote an appreciation of Chinese culture among Western intellectuals, marks him as one of the key influences on the modern “New Confucian” movement, which seeks to promote Confucianism as a spiritual tradition that is fully compatible with democracy, science, and other aspects of modernity. Zhang’s participation in this movement probably stands as his foremost legacy in the world of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Despite Zhang’s stature as a founder of New Confucianism and a promoter of Neo-Confucian studies in the West, he is little studied today, especially by Western scholars. Most Western research on Zhang’s thought has focused on his political philosophy and activism—an approach exemplified by the work of Roger B. Jeans (1997). Studies that depart from this rule include those of Umberto Bresciani (2001) and Edmund S.K. Fung (2003). German scholars have taken a particular interest in the ways in which Zhang’s work might apply to resolving modern problems, such as the deterioration of social relationships and the spiritual vacuum perceived in contemporary societies. Werner Messner (1994) has devoted attention to the tension between the process of modernization and the will to find a specific way (Sonderweg) for China in the thought of modern Chinese philosophers, especially Zhang.

Unsurprisingly, interest in Zhang’s work has been greater in the Chinese-speaking world, especially outside of mainland China. Zhang’s friends and associates produced much of the early scholarship on his thought. Xue Huayuan’s 1993 study of Zhang’s political activity ranks with Jeans’ work among the major research on Zhang produced to date. Within mainland China, for many years Zhang’s thought was proscribed because his idealist views and “bourgeois” background. Even after studies of Zhang by mainland Chinese scholars began to appear in the 1990s, many—such as those by Lü Xichen and Chen Ying (1996)—were harshly critical of his shortcomings as seen from a Marxist perspective. More recently, Zheng Dahua (1997, 1999) has produced more sympathetic scholarship on Zhang’s thought, while Chai Wenhua (2004) has explored Zhang’s conception of culture in particular. Most recently, Weng Hekai’s work (2010) focuses on Zhang’s contributions to the question of Chinese nation-building, especially the influence of John Stuart Mill to Zhang’s thinking about this issue. As interest in Zhang’s special concerns, such as Chinese cultural unity, constitutionalism, and an authentically Chinese modernity, intensifies in contemporary China, interest in Zhang’s legacy is sure to increase there and elsewhere.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

  • Chang, Carsun.  The Third Force in China, New York: Bookman Associates, 1952.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucian thought. 2 vols. New York: Bookman Associates, 1957-1962.
  • Chang, Carsun. Wang Yang-ming: Idealist Philosopher of Sixteenth-Century China. Jamaica, NY: St.  John’s University Press, 1962.
  • Chang, Carsun, and Rudolf Eucken. Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa, Leipzig: Quelle & Meyer, 1922.
  • Chang, Carsun, and Kalidas Nag.  China and Gandhian India. Calcutta: The Book Company, 1956.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Guoxian yi (1921). In Xian Zheng zhi dao (Beijing: Qianghua daxue chubanshe, 2006a).
  • Zhang, Junmai. Minzu fuxing de xueshu jichu (1935). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006b.
  • Zhang, Junmai.  Mingri zhi Zhongguo wenhua (1936). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006c.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Li guo zhi dao (1938). In Xian Zheng zhi dao (Beijing: Qianghua daxue chubanshe, 2006d).
  • Zhang, Junmai. Yili xue shi jiang gangyao (1955). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Bijiao Zhong Ri Yangming xue. Taibei: Taiwan shangwu yinshu guan, 1955.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Bianzheng weiwu zhuyi bolun. Hong Kong: Youlian chubanshe, 1958.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Zhongguo zhuanzhi junzhu zhengzhi pingyi. Taibei: Hongwen guan chubanshe, 1986.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Rujia zhexue zhi fuxing. Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006.
  • Zhang, Junmai, and Wenxi Cheng. Zhong Xi Yin zhexue wenji. 2 vols. Taibei: Taiwan xuesheng shuju, 1970.
  • Zhang, Junmai, and Huayuan Xue. Yijiusijiu nian yihou Zhang Junmai yanlun ji. Taibei : Daoxiang chubanshe, 1989.

b. Secondary Studies

  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Chai, Wenhua. Xiandai xin ruxue wenhua guan yanjiu. Beijing: Xinhua shudian, 2004.
  • Chen, Huifen. “Minzu xing, Shidai xing, Zizhu xing: 1930 niandai Zhang Junmai de wenhua jueze.” Taiwan shida lishi xuebao 28 (June 2000): 109–158.
  • Chen, Xianchu. Jingshen ziyou yu minzu fuxing – Zhang Junmai sixiang zonglun. Changsha: Hunan Jiaoyu chubanshe, 1999.
  • Chi, Wen-shun. Ideological conflicts in Modern China: Democracy and Authoritarianism.  New Brunswick: Transaction Books, 1986.
  • Fang, Shiduo, ed. Zhang Junmai zhuanji ziliao. 8 vols. Taibei: Tianyi, 1979-1981.
  • Frohlich, Thomas. Staatsdenken im China der Republikzeit (1912–1949): Die Instrumentalisierung philosophischer Ideen bei chinesischen Intellektuellen. Frankfurt: Campus Verlag, 2000.
  • Fung, Edmund S.K. “New Confucianism and Chinese Democratization: The Thought and Predicament of Zhang Junmai.” Twentieth Century China 28/2 (April 2003): 41-71.
  • He, Xinquan (Ho Hsin-Chuan). “Zhang Junmai de Xinruxue qimeng jihua : yi ge xiandai vs. Houxiandai shidu.” Taiwan dongya wenming yanjiu xuekan 8/1/15 (July 2011): 209-234.
  • Hung, Mao-hsiung. Carsun Chang (1887–1969) und seine Vorstellung vom Sozialismus in China.  Ph.D. diss.  Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität, 1980.
  • Jeans, Roger B. Syncretism in Defense of Confucianism: An Intellectual and Political Biography of Early Years of Chang Chünmai, 1887-1923. Ph.D. diss., George Washington University, 1974.
  • Jeans, Roger B. Democracy and socialism in Republican China: the politics of Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang), 1906-1941.  Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1997.
  • Jiang, Yongzhen. “Zhang Junmai.”  In Shounan Wang, ed., Zhongguo lidai sixiang jia (Taipei: Taiwan shangwu yinshu guan faxing, 1987), 10: 6230-6352.
  • Liu, Yilin, and Qingfeng Luo. Zhang Junmai pinglun. Nanchang: Bai hua zhou wenyi chubanshe, 1996.
  • Lü, Xichen, and Ying Chen. Xin ruxue: Zhang Junmai sixiang yanjiu. Tianjin: Tianjin renmin chubanshe, 1996.
  • Meissner, Werner. China zwischen nationalem “Sonderweg”, und universaler Modernisierung – Zur Rezeption westlichen Denkens in China.  Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag, 1994.
  • Peterson, Kent McLean. A Political Biography of Zhang Junmai, 1887-1949. Ph.D. diss., Princeton University, 1999.
  • Tan, Chester C.  Chinese Political Thought in the 20th Century. Melbourne: Wren Pub., 1972.
  • Weng, Hekai. Xiandai Zhongguo de Ziyou minzu zhuyi: Zhang Junmai Minzu jianguo sixiang pingzhuan. Beijing: Falü chubanshe, 2010.
  • Xu, Jilin. Wuqiong de kunhuo: Huang Yanpei, Zhang Junmai yu xiandai Zhongguo. Shanghai: Sanlian shudian, 1998.
  • Xue, Huayuan. Minzhu xianzheng yu minzu zhuyi de bianzheng fazhan: Zhang Junmai sixiang yanjiu.  Taibei: Daohe chubanshe, 1993.
  • Yang, Yongqian. Zhonghua minguo xianfa zhi fu: Zhang Junmai zhuanji. Taibei: Tangshan, 1993.
  • Ye, Qizhong (Yap Key-chong). “Cong Zhang Junmai he Ding Wenjiang liang ren he Renshengguan yi wen kan 1923 nian ‘Ke Xuan lunzhan’ de baofa yu kuozhan.”  Zhongyang yanjiu yuan jindai shi yanjiu shuo jikan 25 (June 1996): 211-267.
  • Zhang, Rulun. “Zhongguo xiandai sixiang shang de Zhang Junmai.” In Jilin Xu, ed., Ershi Shiji Zhongguo sixiang shi lun (Shanghai: Dongfang chuban zhongxin, 2000), 2:124-153.
  • Zheng, Dahua. Zhang Junmai zhuan. Beijing: Zhonghua shuju, 1997.
  • Zheng, Dahua. Zhang Junmai xueshu sixiang pingzhuan. Beijing: Beijing Tushuguan chubanshe, 1999a.
  • Zheng Dahua. Liangqi qicai – Mingren bixia de Zhang Junmai. Shanghai: Dongfang chuban zhongxin, 1999b.
  • Zheng, Jiadong. Xiandai xin rujia gailun. Nanning: Guangxi renmin chubanshe, 1990.


Author Information

Joseph Ciaudo
Institute of Eastern Languages and Civilizations

Latin American Philosophy

Latin American Philosophy

This article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy: the thinking of its indigenous peoples, the debates over conquest and colonization, the arguments for national independence in the eighteenth century, the challenges of nation-building and modernization in the nineteenth century, the concerns over various forms of development in the twentieth century, and the diverse interests in Latin American philosophy during the opening decades of the twenty-first century. Rather than attempt to provide an exhaustive and impossibly long list of scholars’ names and dates, this article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy while trying to provide a meaningful sense of detail by focusing briefly on individual thinkers whose work points to broader philosophical trends that are inevitably more complex and diverse than any encyclopedic treatment can hope to capture.

The term “Latin American philosophy” refers broadly to philosophy in, from, or about Latin America. However, the definitions of both “Latin America” and “philosophy” are historically fluid and contested, leading to even more disagreement when combined. “Latin America” typically refers to the geographic areas on the American continent where languages derived from Latin are widely spoken: Portuguese in Brazil, and Spanish in most of Central America, South America, and parts of the Caribbean. The French-speaking parts of the Caribbean are sometimes included as well, but all mainland North American regions north of the Rio Grande are excluded in spite of French being widely spoken in Canada. Although it is anachronistic to speak of Latin American philosophy before the 1850s when the term “Latin America” first entered usage, most scholars agree that Latin American philosophy extends at least as far back as the sixteenth century when the Spanish founded the first schools and seminaries in the “New World”. Given this widespread agreement that there was “Latin American philosophy” before anyone was using the term “Latin America,” many scholars have argued for including pre-Columbian and pre-Cabralian thought in the history of Latin American philosophy. A number of indigenous cultures (particularly the Aztecs, Mayas, Incas, and Tupi-Guarani) produced sophisticated systems of thought long before Europeans arrived with their own understanding of “philosophy.”

The scholarly debate over whether or not to include indigenous thought in the history of Latin American philosophy reveals that the question of what constitutes Latin American philosophy hinges upon both our understanding of what constitutes Latin America and our understanding of what constitutes philosophy. It is worthwhile to remember that these and other labels are the products of human activity and dispute, not the result of a pre-ordained teleological process. Just as “America” was not called “America” by its indigenous inhabitants, the term “Latin America” emerged in the nineteenth century from outside of the region in French intellectual circles. The term competed against terms like “Ibero-America” until “Latin America” gained widespread and largely unquestioned usage in public and academic discourse in the second half of the twentieth century. More than a debate over mere terms, Latin American philosophy demonstrates a longstanding preoccupation with the identity of Latin America itself and a lively debate over the authenticity of its philosophy. Given the history of colonialism in the region, much of the history of Latin American philosophy analyzes ethical and sociopolitical issues, frequently treating concrete problems of practical concern like education or political revolution.

Table of Contents

  1. Indigenous Period
  2. Colonial Period
    1. Scholasticism and Debates on Conquest
    2. Post-conquest Indigenous Thought
    3. Proto-nationalism
    4. Proto-feminism
    5. Enlightenment Philosophy
  3. Nineteenth Century
    1. Political Independence
    2. Mental and Cultural Emancipation
    3. Positivism
  4. Twentieth Century
    1. Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism
    2. Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions
    3. Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy
    4. Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy
    5. Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation
    6. Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism
  5. Twenty-First Century
    1. Plurality of Philosophies in Latin America
    2. Normalization of Latin American Philosophy in the United States
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Indigenous Period

Most histories of Western philosophy claim that philosophy began in ancient Greece with Thales of Miletus (c.624–c.546 B.C.E.) and other pre-Socratics who engaged in sophisticated speculation about the origins of the universe and its workings. There is ample evidence that a number of indigenous peoples in present-day Latin America also engaged in this sort of sophisticated speculation well before the 1500s when Europeans arrived to ask the question of whether it was philosophy. Moreover, a few Europeans during the early colonial period, including the Franciscan priest Bernardino de Sahagún (1499-1590), reported the existence of philosophy and philosophers among the indigenous Aztecs of colonial New Spain. In any case, whether or not most sixteenth-century European explorers, conquistadores, and missionaries believed that there were indigenous philosophies and philosophers, indigenous cultures produced sophisticated systems of thought centuries before Europeans arrived.

The largest and most notable of these indigenous civilizations are: the Aztec (in present-day central Mexico), the Maya (in present-day southern Mexico and northern Central America), and the Inca (in present-day western South America centered in Peru). Considerable challenges face scholars attempting to understand their complex systems of thought, since almost all of their texts and the other artifacts that would have testified most clearly concerning their intellectual production were systematically burned or otherwise destroyed by European missionaries who considered them idolatrous. Nevertheless, scholars have used the handful of pre-colonial codices and other available sources to reconstruct plausible interpretations of these philosophies, while remaining cognizant of the dangers inherent in using Western philosophical concepts to understand non-Western thought. See the article on Aztec Philosophy for an excellent example.

2. Colonial Period

Academic philosophy during the colonial period was dominated by scholasticism imported from the Iberian Peninsula. With the support of Charles V—the first king of Spain and Holy Roman Emperor from 1516 to 1556—schools, monasteries, convents, and seminaries were established across the Indies (as the American continent and Caribbean were known then). Mexico was the main philosophical center in the early colonial period, with Peru gaining importance in the seventeenth century. The adherents of various religious orders who taught at these centers of higher learning emphasized the texts of medieval scholastics like Thomas Aquinas and Duns Scotus, as well as their Iberian commentators, particularly those associated with the School of Salamanca, for example, Francisco de Vitoria (c.1483-1546), Domingo de Soto (1494-1560), and Francisco Suárez (1548-1617). The thoroughly medieval style and sources of their theological and philosophical disputations concerning the Indies and its peoples contrast starkly with the extraordinarily new epistemological, ethical, religious, legal, and political questions that arose over time alongside attempts to colonize and missionize the New World. Much of the philosophy developed in the Indies appeared in isolation from its social and political context. For example, there was nothing uniquely Mexican about Antonio Rubio’s (1548-1615) Logica mexicana (1605). This careful analysis of Aristotelian logic in light of recent scholastic developments brought fame to the University of Mexico when it was adopted as logic textbook back in Europe where it went through seven editions.

a. Scholasticism and Debates on Conquest

One of the most famous philosophical debates of the early colonial period concerned the supposed rights of the Spanish monarchy over the indigenous peoples of the Indies. Bartolomé de las Casas (1484-1566) debated Ginés de Sepúlveda (1490-1573) at the Council of Valladolid (1550-1551). Sepúlveda, who had never traveled to America, defended the Spanish conquest as an instance of just war, outlined the rights of the colonizers to seize native lands and possessions, and claimed that it was morally just to enslave the Indians, arguing on the basis of Thomism, Scripture, and Aristotelian philosophy. Las Casas countered Sepúlveda’s arguments by drawing upon the same theological and philosophical sources as well as decades of his own experiences living in different parts of the Indies. Las Casas argued that the war against the Indians was unjust, that neither Spain nor the Church had jurisdiction over Indians who had not accepted Christ, and that Aristotle’s category of “natural slaves” did not apply to the Indians. No formal winner of the debate was declared, but it did lead to las Casas’ most influential work, In Defense of the Indians, written from 1548-1550.

b. Post-conquest Indigenous Thought

Indigenous perspectives on some of these philosophical issues emerge in post-conquest texts that also depict pre-colonial life and history in light of more recent colonial violence. The work of Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616), a native Andean intellectual and artist, serves as an excellent example. Written around 1615 and addressed to King Philip III of Spain, Guamán Poma’s The First New Chronicle and Good Government consists of nearly 800 pages of text in Spanish accompanied by many Quechua phrases and nearly 400 line drawings. Guamán Poma skillfully combines local histories, Spanish chronicles of conquest, Catholic moral and philosophical discourses (including those of Bartolomé de las Casas), various eyewitness accounts (including his own), and oral reports in multiple indigenous languages, to build a powerful case for maximum Indian autonomy given the ongoing history of abuse by Spanish conquerors, priests, and government officials. This and other post-conquest native texts affirm the ongoing existence of native intellectual traditions, contest the colonial European understanding of indigenous peoples as barbarians, and challenge Eurocentric views of American geography and history.

c. Proto-nationalism

As part of European conquest and colonization a new social hierarchy or caste system based on race was developed. White Spanish colonists born on the Iberian Peninsula (peninsulares) held the highest position, followed by white Spaniards born in the Indies (criollos), both of whom were far above Indians (indios) and Africans (negros) in the hierarchy. First generation individuals born to parents of different races were called mestizos (Indian and white), mulatos (African and white), and sambos (Indian and African). The subsequent mixing of already mixed generations further complicated the hierarchy and led to a remarkably complex racial terminology. In any case, higher education was almost always restricted to whites, who typically had to demonstrate the purity of their racial origins in order to enroll. By the seventeenth century, well-educated criollos were developing new perspectives on the Indies and their colonial experience. Anxious to maintain their status through intellectual ties to the Iberian Peninsula while nevertheless establishing their own place and tradition in America, these thinkers reflected on diverse topics while developing a proto-nationalist discourse that would eventually lead to independence. The work of Carlos de Sigüenza y Góngora (1645-1700) provides an interesting case of criollo ambivalence with respect to American identity. On the one hand, Sigüenza idealized Aztec society and was one of the first criollos to appropriate their past in order to articulate the uniqueness of American identity. On the other hand, this did not prevent Sigüenza from despising contemporary Indians, especially when they rioted in the streets during a food shortage in Mexico City.

d. Proto-feminism

Similar to the way in which scholars have retrospectively perceived a budding nationalism in intellectuals like Sigüenza, Sor Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651-1695) is widely regarded as a forerunner of feminist philosophy in Latin America. Just as non-whites were typically barred from higher education based on European assumptions of racial inferiority, women were not permitted access to formal education on the assumption of sexual inferiority. Basic education was provided in female convents, but their reading and writing still occurred under the supervision of male church officials and confessors. After establishing a positive reputation for knowledge across literature, history, music, languages, and natural science, Sor Juana was publicly reprimanded for entering the male-dominated world of theological debate. Under the penname of Sor Philothea de la Cruz (Sister Godlover of the Cross), the Bishop of Puebla told Sor Juana to abandon intellectual pursuits that were improper for a woman. Sor Juana’s extensive answer to Sor Philothea subtly but masterfully defends rational equality between men and women, makes a powerful case for women’s right to education, and develops an understanding of wisdom as a form of self-realization.

e. Enlightenment Philosophy

Although leading Latin American intellectuals in the eighteenth century did not completely abandon scholasticism, they began to draw upon new sources in order to think through new social and political questions. Interest grew in early modern European philosophy and the Enlightenment, especially as this “new philosophy” entered the curriculum of schools and universities. The experimental and scientific methods gained ground over the syllogism, just as appeals to scriptural or Church authority were slowly replaced by appeals to experience and reason. The rational liberation from intellectual authority that characterized the Enlightenment also fueled desires for individual liberty and national autonomy, which became defining issues in the century that followed.

3. Nineteenth Century

a. Political Independence

In the early nineteenth century, national independence movements swept through Latin America. However, some scholars have categorized these wars for independence as civil wars, since the majority of combatants on both sides were Latin Americans. Criollos, although a numerical minority (roughly 15% of the Latin American population in the early nineteenth century), led the push for political independence and clearly gained the most from it. In contrast, most of the combatants were mestizos (roughly 25% of the population) and indios (roughly 45% of the population) whose positions in society after national independence were scarcely improved and sometimes even made worse.

Scholars disagree about whether to understand changes in Latin American thought as causes or as effects of these political independence movements. In any case, Simon Bolívar (1783-1830) is generally considered to be their most prominent leader. Not only was “The Liberator” a military man and political founder of new nations, he was also an intellectual who developed a clear and prescient understanding of the challenges that lay ahead for Latin America not just in his own time but well into the future. Bolívar gained his philosophical, historical, and geographical perspective from both book-learning and extensive travels throughout much of Europe and the United States. Frequently citing the French Enlightenment philosopher Montesquieu (1689-1755) in his political writings, Bolívar believed that good laws and institutions were not the sorts of things that should simply be copied. Rather they must be carefully adapted to particular historical, geographical, and cultural realities. In this light, Bolívar perceived that the immediate costs of Latin American independence included anarchy, chaos, and a general lack of both personal and political virtue. He thus sought to create strong but subtle forms of centralized power capable of balancing new political freedoms. At the same time he sought to establish an educational system capable of developing an autonomous, independent national consciousness from a heteronomous and dependent colonial consciousness that had never been permitted to practice the art of government. Bolívar’s passionate calls for freedom and equality for all Latin Americans, including the emancipation of slaves, were thus consistently coupled with reasons that justified the concentration of authority in a small, well-educated group of mostly criollo elite. The result was that colonial socioeconomic structures remained firmly intact even after independence, leaving a gap between the ideals of liberty and the practical reality experienced by most people.

b. Mental and Cultural Emancipation

By the middle of the nineteenth century, most Latin American countries were no longer colonies, although a few did not achieve independence until considerably later (for example, Cuba in 1898). Nevertheless, there was a widespread sense even among political and intellectual elites that complete independence had not been achieved. Many thinkers framed the problem in terms of a distinction been the political independence that had already been achieved and the mental or cultural emancipation that remained as the task for a new generation. By developing their own diagnosis of the lingering colonial mindset, this generation sought to give birth to a new American culture, literature, and philosophy. Some of the most important were: Andrés Bello (1781-1865) in Venezuela,  Francisco Bilbao (1823-1865) and José Victorino Lastarria (1817-1888) in Chile, Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810-1884) and Domingo Faustino Sarmiento (1811-1888) in Argentina, Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) in Mexico, Juan Montalvo (1833-1889) in Ecuador, Manuel González Prada (1844-1918) in Peru, and Luis Pereira Barreto (1840-1923) in Brazil. Among these thinkers, Juan Bautista Alberdi was the first to explicitly address the question of the character and future of Latin American philosophy, which he believed to be intimately linked with the character and future of the Latin American people. (It is worth reiterating the fact that the term “Latin America” still did not exist and that Alberdi spoke about the future of “American philosophy” as a reflection of the “American people” without meaning to include the philosophy or people of the United States). For Alberdi, Latin American philosophy should be used an intellectual tool for developing an understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the people of Latin America. (It is worth nothing that Alberdi’s references to “the people” of Latin America were aimed primarily at his fellow criollos, implicitly excluding the non-white majority of the population). Alberdi’s Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina served as one of the major foundations for Argentina’s 1853 Constitution, which with amendments remains in force to this day.

c. Positivism

Almost all of the thinkers from the generation that sought intellectual and cultural emancipation from the colonial past came to identify with the philosophy of positivism, which dominated much of the intellectual landscape of Latin America throughout the second half of the nineteenth century. Strictly speaking, positivism originated in Europe with the French philosopher Auguste Comte (1798-1859), but it was warmly welcomed by many Latin American intellectuals who saw Comte’s motto of “order and progress” as a European version of what they had been struggling for themselves. While adapting positivism to their own regional conditions, they presented it optimistically as a philosophy based upon an experimental and scientific method that could modernize both the economy and the educational system in order to produce social and political stability. The influence of positivism on Latin America is perhaps most vividly portrayed in Brazil’s current flag, adopted in 1889, which features the words Ordem e Progresso (Order and Progress). However, the literal adoption of Comte’s motto masks the fact that the meaning of positivism in Latin America underwent considerable change under the influence of the English philosopher Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) and others who both sought to reformulate positivism in light of Darwinian evolutionary theory. This later variety of evolutionary positivism was also frequently called materialism, characterized by its rejection of dualist and idealist metaphysics, its mechanistic philosophy of history, its promotion of intense industrial competition as the primary means of material progress, and its frequent explanation of various social and political problems in biological terms of racial characteristics. While the precise understanding of positivism differed from thinker to thinker and the scope of positivism’s influence varied from country to country, there is little question of its overall importance.

The history of positivism in Mexico can be used to illustrate the shifting meaning of positivism in a particular national context. Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) founded the National Preparatory School in Mexico City in 1868 and made a modified form of Comte’s positivism the basis of its curriculum. Barreda understood Mexico’s social disorder to be a direct reflection of intellectual disorder, which he sought to reorganize in its entirety under the authority of President Benito Juárez. Like Comte, Barreda wanted to place all education in the service of moral, social, and economic progress. Unlike Comte, Barreda interpreted political liberalism as an expression of the positive spirit, modifying Comte’s famous motto to read: “Liberty as the means; order as the base; progress as the end.” The philosophical positions held by the second generation of Mexican positivists were quite different, even though they all hailed Barreda as their teacher. Eventually, many of them joined the científicos, a circle of technocratic advisors to the dictator Porfirio Díaz. The most famous among them, Justo Sierra (1848-1912), developed his philosophy of Mexican history using Spencer’s theory of evolution in an attempt to accelerate the evolution of Mexico through a kind of social engineering. Although Sierra initially judged Porfirio Díaz’s dictatorship to be necessary in order to secure the order necessary to make progress possible, in the final years of his life Sierra cast doubt upon both positivism and the dictatorship it had been used to support.

One of the earliest critics of positivism in Latin America was the Cuban philosopher Jose Martí (1853-1895). His criticism was linked to a different vision of what he called Nuestra América (Our America”), reclaiming the word “America” from the way it is commonly used to refer exclusively to the United States of America. Whereas positivists or materialists tended to explain the evolutionary backwardness of Latin America in terms of the biological backwardness of the races that constituted the majority of its population, Martí pointed to the ongoing international history of political and economic policies that systematically disadvantaged these same people. Like Juan Bautista Alberdi had done a generation before, Martí called for Latin American intellectuals to develop their own understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the Latin American people. Unlike Alberdi, Martí took a more positive and inclusive view of Latin American identity by giving indios, mestizos, negros, and mulatos a place alongside criollos in the task of building a truly free Latin America. According to Marti, the ongoing failure of the United States to grant equality to Native Americans and former slaves in the construction of its America was just as dangerous to imitate as the European political model. Unfortunately, Martí died young in the Cuban war to gain political independence from Spain, but as an idealist he believed that powerful ideas like liberty must play an equal role in freeing Latin America from the imperialistic impulses of both Europe and the United States.

4. Twentieth Century

A backlash against the intellectual hegemony of positivism marks the beginning of the twentieth century in Latin America. The “scientific” nature of positivism was charged with being “scientistic;” materialism was challenged by new forms of idealism and vitalism; and evolutionism was criticized by various social and political philosophies that supported revolution. As the century wore on, there was a dramatic proliferation of philosophical currents so that speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole becomes increasingly difficult. Ironically, this difficulty arises during the very same period that the term “Latin America” first began to achieve widespread use in public and academic discourse, and the period that the first historical treatments of Latin American philosophy appeared. In response to the problems inherent in speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole, scholars have narrowed their scope by writing about the history of twentieth century philosophy in a particular Latin American country (especially Mexico, Argentina, or Brazil); in a particular region (for example, Central America or the Caribbean); in a particular philosophical tradition (for example, Marxism, phenomenology, existentialism, neo-scholasticism, historicism, philosophy of liberation, analytic philosophy, or feminist philosophy); or in and through a list of important figures. Alternatively, attempts to provide a more panoramic vision of Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century typically proceed by delineating somewhere between three and six generations or periods. For the sake of continuity in scope and detail, the present article utilizes this method and follows a six-generation schema that assigns a rough year to each generation based upon when they were writing rather than when they were born (modeled upon Beorlegui 2006).

a. Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism

The members of the first twentieth-century generational group of 1900 are often called “the generation of founders” or “the generation of patriarchs,” following the influential terminology of Francisco Romero or Francisco Miró Quesada, respectively. Members of this generation include José Enrique Rodó (1871-1917) and Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) in Uruguay, Alejandro Korn (1860-1936) in Argentina; Alejandro Deústua (1849-1945) in Peru; Raimundo de Farias Brito (1862-1917) in Brazil; Enrique José Varona (1849-1933) in Cuba; and Enrique Molina Garmendia (1871-1964) in Chile. The year of 1900 conveniently refers to the change of century and marks the publication of Rodó’s Ariel, which exerted tremendous influence on other Latin American intellectuals. Like those that had come before them, Rodó and the other members of this generation did not write primarily for other philosophers but rather for a broader public in an attempt to influence the courses of their countries. Like Jose Martí, Rodó criticized a particular form of positivism or materialism, which he associated with the United States or Anglo-Saxon America and presented in the barbaric character of “Caliban” from Shakespeare’s The Tempest. In contrast, Rodó presents the civilized “Ariel” as the Latin American spirit of idealism that values art, sentiment, philosophy, and critical thinking. Rodó thus recommends a return to the classical values of ancient Greece and the best of contemporary European (especially French) philosophy. This recommendation is presented in contrast to what Rodó calls nordomanía or the manic delatinization of America, that is, the growing but unthinking imitation of the United States, its plutocracy, and its reductively material and individualist understandings of success.

b. Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions

The members of the generation of 1915 are often grouped with the previous generation of “founders” or “patriarchs” but they are presented here separately because they represent a growing interest in the mestizo or indigenous dimensions of Latin American identity. As it had since colonial times, Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century continued to connect many of its philosophical and political problems to the identity of its peoples. But in light of events like the Mexican revolution that began in 1910, some thinkers began to rebel against the historical tendency to view mestizos and indigenous peoples as negative elements to be overcome through ongoing assimilation and European immigration. Principal members of this generation include Antonio Caso (1883-1946), José Vasconcelos (1882-1959), and Alfonso Reyes (1889-1959) in Mexico; Pedro Henríquez Ureña (1884-1946) in Dominican Republic; Cariolano Alberini (1886-1960) in Argentina; Víctor Raúl Haya de la Torre (1895-1979) and José Carlos Mariátegui (1894-1930) in Peru. The first four thinkers just listed were members of the famous Atheneum of Youth, an intellectual and artistic group founded in 1909 that is crucial for understanding Mexican culture in the twentieth century. Drawing upon Rodó’s Ariel—as well as other American and European philosophers including Henri Bergson (1859–1941), Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900), and William James (1842-1910)—the Atheneum developed a sweeping criticism of the reigning positivism of the científicos and began to take Latin American philosophy in new directions. The members of the Atheneum also explicitly linked their intellectual revolution to Mexico’s social revolution, thereby recapitulating the nineteenth century concern to achieve both political independence and mental emancipation. Jose Vasconcelos’ most famous work, The Cosmic Race (1925), presents a vision of Mexico and Latin America more generally as the birthplace of a new mixed race whose mission would be to usher in a new age by ethnically and spiritually fusing all of the existing races. Vasconcelos subsumed the 1910 Mexican Revolution in a larger world-historical vision of the New World in which Mexicans and other Latin American peoples would redeem humanity from its long history of violence, achieve political stability, and undertake the integral spiritual development of humankind (replacing prevailing notions of human progress as merely materialistic or technological).

Focusing on Indians rather than mestizos, José Carlos Mariátegui offered a vision of Peru and Indo-America (his preferred term for Latin America) that would reverse the disastrous social and economic effects of the conquest. One of the most important Marxist thinkers in the history of Latin America, Mariátegui tied the future of Peru to the socialist liberation of its indigenous peasants, who made up the vast majority of the country’s population and whose lives were only made worse by national independence. Unlike orthodox scientific Marxists, Mariátegui believed that aesthetics and spirituality had a key role to play in fueling the revolution by uniting various marginalized peoples in the belief that they could create a new, more egalitarian society. Furthermore, Mariátegui grounded his analysis in the historical and cultural conditions of the Andean region, which had developed indigenous forms of agrarian communism destroyed by the Spanish colonizers. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality, published in 1928, highlights the Indian character of Peru and offers a structural interpretation of the ongoing exploitation of indigenous peoples as rooted in the usurpation of their communal lands. Mariátegui argued that administrative, educational, and humanitarian approaches to overcoming the suffering of Indians will necessarily fail unless they overcome the local racialized class system that operates in the larger context of global capitalism.

c. Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy

The members of the third twentieth-century generational group of 1930 are often called the “forgers” or the “shapers” (depending upon the translation of Miró Quesada’s influential term forjadores). Members include Samuel Ramos (1897-1959) and José Gaos (1900-1969) in Mexico; Francisco Romero (1891-1962) and Carlos Astrada (1894-1970) in Argentina; and Juan David García Bacca (1901-1992) in Venezuela. After the first two generations of “founders” or “patriarchs” had criticized positivism in order to develop their own personal versions of the philosophic enterprise, the forjadores developed the philosophical foundations and institutions that they took to be necessary for bringing their authentically Latin American philosophical projects to the far better-recognized level of European philosophy. Mariátegui can be understood as a precursor in this respect, since his philosophical influences were primarily European, but his philosophy was rooted in a distinctively Peruvian reality. In their quest to philosophize from a distinctively Latin American perspective, many of the forjadores were greatly influenced by the “perspectivism” of the Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955). Ortega’s impact on Latin American philosophy only increased—particularly in Mexico, Argentina, and Venezuela—with the arrival of Spaniards exiled during the Spanish Civil War (1936-1939). José Gaos was undoubtedly the most influential of these transterrados (transplants), who helped found new educational institutions, publish new academic journals, establish new publishing houses, and translate hundreds of works in Ancient and European philosophy.

The long philosophical career of Juan David García Bacca illustrates the shifting philosophical currents and geographic displacements that forged new developments in Latin American philosophy. Author of over five hundred philosophical works and translations, García Bacca received his philosophical training in Spain, largely under the influence of neo-scholasticism until Ortega woke him from his dogmatic slumber. García Bacca spent the first years of his exile (1938-1941) in Quito, Ecuador, where he began to deconstruct the Aristotelian or Thomistic conception of human nature and replace it with an understanding of man as historical, technological, and transfinite. In other words, García Bacca presented human beings as finite creatures who are nevertheless godlike in their infinite capacity to recreate themselves. In 1941, García Bacca accepted an invitation from the National Autonomous University of Mexico (UNAM) to teach a course on the philosophy of the influential German existentialist and phenomenologist Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). In 1946, García Bacca along with other transterrados founded the Department of Philosophy at the Central University of Venezuela, where he continued to work out his philosophy in dialogue with the traditions of historicism, vitalism, phenomenology, hermeneutics, and existentialism. Following a broad intellectual trend in Latin America after the Cuban revolution of 1959, his understanding of the Latin American context was transformed under the influence of Marxism beginning in the 1960s. García Bacca gave his understanding of human nature as transfinite a substantially new twist by requiring nothing less than the transformation of human nature under socialism. Once again indicating broad intellectual trends in the 1980s, García Bacca began distancing himself somewhat from Marxism and contributed greatly to the history of philosophy in Latin America by publishing substantial anthologies of philosophical thought in Venezuela and Colombia. 

d. Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy

Given the tremendous progress in the institutionalization of Latin American philosophy from roughly 1940 until 1960, this period is frequently referred to as that of “normalization” (again following the influential periodization of Francisco Romero). The generation that benefited was the first to consistently receive formal academic training in philosophy in order to become professors in an established system of universities. These philosophers developed an increasing consciousness of Latin American philosophical identity, aided in part by increased travel and dialogue between Latin American countries and universities (some of it forced under politically oppressive conditions that led to exile). Members of this fourth generation include Risieri Frondizi (1910-1985) and Augusto Salazar Bondy (1925-1974) in Argentina; Miguel Reale (1910-2006) in Brazil; Francisco Miró Quesada (1918- ) in Peru; Arturo Ardao (1912-2003) in Uruguay; and Leopoldo Zea (1912-2004) and Luis Villoro (1922- ) in Mexico. Building upon the philosophies of their teachers, as well as the philosophical conception of hispanidad that many inherited from the Spanish philosophers Miguel de Unamuno (1864-1936) and Ortega y Gasset, this generation developed a critical philosophical perspective that is often called “Latin Americanism.” The philosophy of Leopold Zea is widely taken to be exemplary of this approach. Under the influence of Samuel Ramos and the direction of Jose Gaós at the UNAM, Zea defended his 1944 dissertation on the rise and fall of positivism in Mexico, later translated as Positivism in Mexico (1974). In 1949, Zea founded the famous Hyperion Group of philosophers seeking to shed light upon Mexican identity and reality. Convinced that the past must be known and understood in order to construct an authentic future, Zea went on to situate his work in a panoramic philosophical view of Latin American history, drawing upon the earlier works of Bolívar, Alberdi, Martí, and many others. Zea’s extensive travels and ongoing professional dialogue with other Latin American philosophers across the Continent resulted in many works, including one translated as The Latin American Mind (1963). He also edited a series of works by other scholars on the history of ideas across Latin America, published by El Fondo de Cultura Económica, Mexico’s largest publishing house. Anticipating themes that marked future generations of Latin American philosophy, Zea’s later works such as Latin America and the World (1969) thematized the concepts of marginalization and liberation while situating Latin American philosophy in a global context. In short, Zea consistently sought to develop a Latin American philosophy that would be capable of grasping Latin America’s concrete history and present circumstances in an authentic, responsible, and ultimately universal way.

Zea’s quest for an authentic Latin American philosophy emerged as part of a larger debate over the nature of Latin American philosophy and whether it was something more than an imitation of European philosophy. An examination of one of Zea’s most famous opponents in this debate—Augusto Salazar Bondy—will help set the stage for the subsequent discussion of the philosophies of liberation that emerged in the 1970s with the next philosophical generation. Bondy lays out his position in his book, ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra América? (1968) [Does a Philosophy of Our America Exist?]. Bondy attacks what he takes to be Zea’s ungrounded idealism and maintains that the existence of an authentic Latin American philosophy is inseparable from the concrete socioeconomic conditions of Latin America, which place it in a situation of dependence and economic underdevelopment in relation to Europe and the United States. This in turn produces a “defective culture” in which inauthentic intellectual works are mistaken for authentic philosophical productions. The problem is not that Latin American philosophy fails to be rooted in concrete reality (a problem that Zea works painstakingly to overcome), but rather that it is concretely rooted in an alienated and divided socioeconomic reality. According to Bondy, the authenticity of Latin American philosophy depends upon the liberation of Latin America from the economic production of its cultural dependence. At the same time, Bondy argues for the inauthenticity of philosophy in Europe and the United States insofar as they depend upon the domination of the Third World. In sum, whereas Zea calls for an authentic philosophical development in Latin America that would critically assimilate the deficiencies of the past, Bondy maintains that liberation from economic domination and cultural dependence is a prerequisite for authentic Latin American philosophy in the future.

Before turning to the next philosophical generation and their philosophies of liberation, it is important to note that there are other major philosophical strands that emerged during the period of normalization (1940-1960). While the period is generally associated with Latin Americanism—which drew upon historicism, existentialism, and phenomenology—other philosophical traditions including Marxism, neo-scholasticism, and analytic philosophy also grew in importance. Important early Latin American analytic philosophers include Vicente Ferreira da Silva (1916-1963) in Brazil, who published work in mathematical logic; Mario Bunge (1919- ) in Argentina and then Canada, who has published extensively in almost all major areas of analytic philosophy; and Héctor-Neri Castañeda (1924-1991) in Guatemala and then the United States, who was a student Wilfrid Sellars (1912-1989) and founded one of the top journals in analytic philosophy, Noûs. Analytic philosophy was further institutionalized in Latin America during the 1960s, especially in Argentina and Mexico, followed by Brazil in the 1970s. In Argentina, Gregorio Kilmovsky (1922-2009) cultivated interest in the philosophy of science, Tomás Moro Simpson (1929- ) did important work in the philosophy of language, and Carlos Alchourrón’s (1931-1996) work on logic and belief revision had an international impact on analytic philosophy and computer science. In Mexico, the Institute of Philosophical Investigations (IIF) and the journal Crítica were both founded in 1967 and continue to serve as focal points for analytic philosophy in Latin America. Notable philosophers at the IIF include Fernando Salmerón (1925-1997), whose major influence was in ethics; Alejandro Rossi (1932-2009), who worked in philosophy of language; and Luis Villoro (1922- ), who works primarily in epistemology and political philosophy. The development of analytic philosophy in Brazil was shaken by the 1964 coup, but resumed in the 1970s. Newton da Costa (1929- ) developed several non-classical logics, most famously paraconsistent logic where certain contradictions are allowed. Oswaldo Chateaubriand (1940- ) has done internationally recognized work in logic, metaphysics, and philosophy of language. Since then, analytic philosophy has continued to grow and develop in Latin America, leading more recently to the 2007 founding of the Asociación Latinoamericana de Filosofía Analítica, whose mission is to promote analytic philosophy through scholarly conferences and other exchanges across Latin America.

e. Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation

After the 1960s, philosophy as a professional academic discipline was well established in Latin America, but it only began to achieve substantial international visibility in the 1970s with the rise of a new generation that developed the philosophy of liberation. The most famous members of this fifth twentieth century generation are from Argentina and include Arturo Andrés Roig (1922-2012), Enrique Dussel (1934- ), and Horacio Cerutti Guldberg (1950- ). The strain of liberation philosophy developed by Ignacio Ellacuría (1930-1989) in El Salvador also stands out as exemplary. In a context marked by violence and political repression, the public philosophical positions of these liberatory thinkers put their lives in jeopardy. Most tragically, Ellacuría was assassinated by a military death squad while chairing the philosophy department of El Salvador’s Universidad Centroamericana. The substantial international impact of the Argentine philosophers of liberation stems in part from their political exile due to the military and state terrorism that characterized the “Dirty War” from 1972-1983. Much like the earlier Spanish transterrados, these philosophers developed and spread their philosophies from their newly adopted countries (Ecuador in the case of Roig, and Mexico in the cases of Dussel and Cerutti Guldberg). Although it should not be confused with the better-known tradition of Latin American liberation theology, Latin American philosophies of liberation emerged from a similar historical and intellectual context that included: a recovery of Latin America’s longstanding preoccupation with political liberation and intellectual independence, the influence of dependency theory in economics, a careful engagement with Marxism, and an emphasis on praxis rooted in an ethical commitment to the liberation of poor or otherwise oppressed groups in the Third World. Yet another parallel strain of Latin American liberationist thought focusing on pedagogy emerged based upon the work of Brazilian philosopher and educator Paulo Freire (1921-1997). Imprisoned and then exiled from Brazil during the military coup of 1964, he developed a vision and method for teaching oppressed peoples (who were often illiterate) how to theorize and practice their own liberation from the dehumanizing socioeconomic conditions that had been imposed upon them. Freire’s book Pedagogy of the Oppressed (1970) drew international attention and became a foundational text in what is now called critical pedagogy.

While Cerutti Guldberg has written the most complete work explaining the intellectual splits that produced different philosophies of liberation—Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana (2006)—Dussel’s name and work are most widely known given his tremendous efforts to promote the philosophy of liberation through dialogue with famous European philosophers including Karl-Otto Apel (1922- ) and Jurgen Habermas (1929) as well as famous North American philosophers including Richard Rorty (1931-2007) and Charles Taylor (1931- ). By analyzing the relationship between Latin American cultural-intellectual dependence and socioeconomic oppression, Dussel seeks to develop transformational conceptions and practices leading to liberation from both of these conditions. Dussel argues that the progress of European philosophy through the centuries has come at the expense of the vast majority of humanity, whose massive poverty has only rarely appeared as a fundamental philosophical theme. Dussel’s best-known early work Philosophy of Liberation (1980) attempts to foreground, diagnose, and transform the oppressive socioeconomic and intellectual systems that are largely controlled by European and North American interests and power groups at the expense of Third World regions including Latin America. Instead of only pretending to be universal, at the expense of most people who are largely ignored, historical and philosophical progress must be rooted in a global dialogue committed to recognizing and listening to the least heard on their own terms. Influenced by the French philosopher Immanuel Levinas (1906-1995), Dussel highlights the importance of this ethical method, which he calls analectical to contrast it with the totalizing tendencies of the Hegelian dialectic. A prolific author of more than fifty books, Dussel’s later work attempts to systematically develop philosophical principles for a critical ethics of liberation alongside a critical politics of liberation. Dussel’s 1998 book, Ethics of Liberation in the Age of Globalization and Exclusion (translated in 2013), is often cited as an important later work.

While not typically categorized as part of the philosophy of liberation in the narrow sense, Latin American feminist philosophy is an important but typically under-recognized form of emancipatory thought that has existed in academic form for at least a century. In 1914, Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) began publicly analyzing and discussing the importance of civil and political rights for women, as well as women’s access to education and professional careers. Vaz Ferreira’s feminist philosophy was published as Sobre feminismo in 1933, the same year that woman gained the right to vote in Uruguay. Given that Vaz Ferreira belongs to the first twentieth century generation of the “patriarchs” of Latin American philosophy, it is worth emphasizing that women were systematically marginalized from the academic discipline of philosophy until much later in the twentieth century, when the feminist movements of the 1970s led to the institutionalization of Women’s Studies or Gender Studies in Latin American universities in the 1980s and 1990s. An important connecting tissue for these movements has been the Encuentros Feminista Latinoamericano y del Caribe, an ongoing series of biennial (later triennial) meetings of Latin American women and feminist activists, first held in 1981 in Bogotá, Colombia. While the diversity that characterizes feminism makes it problematic to make generalized comparisons between Latin American feminism and feminism in Europe and the United States, Latin American feminists have tended to be more concerned with the context of family life and to giving equal importance to ethnicity and class as categories of analysis (Femenías and Oliver 2007). 

One of the earliest and most influential Latin American feminist philosophers was Graciela Hierro (1928-2003), who introduced feminist philosophy into the academic curriculum of the UNAM beginning in the 1970s and organized the first panel on feminism at a national Mexican philosophy conference in 1979. Hierro is best remembered for the feminist ethics of pleasure that she developed beginning with her book Ética y feminismo (1985). Criticizing the “double sexual morality” that assigns asymmetrical moral roles based upon gender, Hierro argues for a hedonistic sexual ethic rooted in a love of self that makes prudence, solidarity, justice, and equity possible. The rise of feminist philosophy alongside other feminist social and intellectual movements in Latin America has also led to the recovery and popularization of writings by marginalized women thinkers, including the work of Sor Juana de la Cruz (1651-1695) discussed above. Another important intellectual resource has been the development of oral history projects or testimonios that seek to document the lives and ideas of countless women living in poverty or obscurity. One of the most famous books in this genre is I, Rigoberta Menchú (1983), the testimonial autobiography of a Quiche Mayan woman, Rigoberta Menchú Tum (1959- ), who began fighting for the rights of women and indigenous people in Guatemala as a teenager and went on to win a Nobel Peace Prize in 1992.

f. Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism

The sixth and last generation of twentieth century Latin American philosophers emerged in the 1980s. While speaking of broad trends is always somewhat misleading given the diversity of approaches and interests, one interesting trend lies in how Latin American philosophers from this generation have contributed to the analysis and criticism of globalization by participating in new intellectual debates concerning postmodernism in the 1980s and postcolonialism in the 1990s. For example, some new philosophers of liberation like Raul Fornet-Betancourt (1946- ) sought to revise fundamental theoretical dichotomies such as center/periphery, domination/liberation, and First World/Third World that were critical in terms of their general thrust but insufficiently nuanced in light of the complex phenomena that go by the name of globalization. Fornet-Betancourt’s own biography points to this complexity, since he was born in Cuba but moved to Germany in 1972, earning his college degree and first PhD in philosophy in Spain, then returning to complete a second PhD in theology and linguistics in Germany, where he is currently a professor who publishes extensively in both German and Spanish. Self-critical of much of his own philosophical training and development, Fornet-Betancourt has rooted himself in Latin American philosophy in order to devise an intercultural approach to understanding philosophy in light of the diverse histories and cultures that have produced human wisdom across time and space. In contrast to globalization, which is a function of a global political economy that does not tolerate differences or alternatives to a global monoculture of capitalism and consumption, Fornet-Betancourt outlines the economic and political conditions that would make genuinely symmetrical intercultural dialogue and exchange possible.

Drawing critically upon discussions of globalization and postmodernism, the discourse of postcolonialism emerged in the final decade of the twentieth century. The basic idea is that globalization has produced a new transnational system of economic colonialism that is distinct from but related to the national and international forms of colonialism that characterized the world between the conquest of America and the Second World War. Among other things, postcolonialism addresses the politics of knowledge in globalized world that is unified by complex webs of exclusion based upon gender, class, race, ethnicity, language, and sexuality. One of the fundamental criticisms leveled by postcolonialism is the way that neo-colonial discourses routinely and violently construct homogeneous wholes like “The Third World” or “Latin America” out of heterogeneous peoples, places, and their cultures. Like postmodernism, postcolonial theory did not initially come from or focus on Latin America, so there is considerable debate about whether or how postcolonial theory should be developed in a Latin American context. A variant of this debate has occurred among Latin American feminists who do not generally view themselves as part of postcolonial feminism, which has been charged with overlooking tremendous differences between the former English and French colonies and the former Spanish and Portuguese colonies (Schutte and Femenías 2010). One of the best-known Latin American thinkers who works critically in conjunction with postcolonial studies is Walter Mignolo (1941- ). He was born in Argentina, where he completed his B.A. in philosophy before moving to Paris to obtain his Ph.D., eventually becoming a professor in the United States. Rather than apply foreign postcolonial theory to the Latin American context, Mignolo has mined the history of Latin America for authors who found ways to challenge or subversively employ the rules of colonial discourse, for example, the native Andean intellectual and artist Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616) discussed above. Mignolo’s book, The Idea of Latin America (2005), excavates the history of how the idea of Latin America came about in order to show how it still rests upon colonial foundations that must be transformed by decolonial theory and practice.

5. Twenty-First Century

a. Plurality of Philosophies in Latin America

In the early twenty-first century, Latin America became home to the ongoing development and institutionalization of many philosophical traditions and approaches including analytic philosophy, Latin Americanism, phenomenology, existentialism, hermeneutics, Marxism, neo-scholasticism, feminism, history of philosophy, philosophy of liberation, postmodernism, and postcolonialism. At the same time, the very idea of Latin America has been posed as a major problem (Mignolo 2005), following historically in the wake of the still unresolved controversy over how philosophy itself should be understood. While the dominant philosophical currents and trends differ both across and within various Latin American countries and regions, all of the major philosophical approaches that predominate in Europe and the United States are well-represented.

b. Normalization of Latin American Philosophy in the United States

The term “Latin American philosophy” has also gained widespread use and attracted considerable research interest in the United States. This is due in large measure to the efforts of a generation of Latino and Latina philosophers who were born in Latin America and went on to become professors in the United States where they teach and publish in better-established philosophical fields as well as in Latin American philosophy. These philosophers include Walter Mignolo (1941- ), María Lugones (1948- ), and Susana Nuccetelli (1954-) from Argentina; Jorge J. E. Gracia (1942- ) and Ofelia Schutte (1945- ) from Cuba; Linda Martín Alcoff (1955- ) from Panama; and Eduardo Mendieta (1963- ) from Colombia. Their philosophical interests and approaches to Latin American philosophy vary greatly and include postcolonial theory, feminism, metaphysics, epistemology, critical philosophy of race, philosophy of liberation, philosophy of language, metaphilosophy, continental philosophy, and critical theory. This generation has also made important contributions to the analysis of, and debate over, Hispanic or Latino/a identity in the United States, especially as it intersects with other complex dimensions of identity including race, ethnicity, nationality, class, language, gender, and sexual orientation.

Borrowing a term from the history of Latin American philosophy, we may eventually be able to speak of the early twenty-first century as the period of normalization for Latin American philosophy in the United States. Given the accomplishments of the generation of mostly Latino and Latina founders, a few philosophy graduate students in the United States have been the first presented with opportunities to receive some formal training in Latin American philosophy and to make it a major part of their research agenda early in their careers. Moreover, the first handful of job listings at universities in the United States have emerged calling for professors who specialize in Latin American philosophy. The early twenty-first century has also been marked by an increasing number of English-language articles and books on Latin American philosophy. Nevertheless, if this trend toward more development of Latin American philosophy is to continue, then large hurdles remain, including a major shortage of primary Latin American philosophical texts available in English translation, a widespread lack of knowledge concerning Latin American philosophy among most professional philosophers in the United States, and the resulting need for most U.S. philosophers interested in Latin American philosophy to maintain an active research agenda and publication record in at least one better-recognized philosophical area or field.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alberdi, Juan Bautista. “Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina.” Translated by Janet Burke and Ted Humphrey. In Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
  • Alcoff, Linda Martín. Visible Identities: Race, Gender, and the Self. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Arciniegas, Germán. Latin America: A Cultural History. Translated by Joan MacLean. New York: Knopf, 1966.
  • Beorlegui, Carlos. Historia del pensamiento filosofico latinoamericano: una busqueda incesante de la identidad. Bilbao: Universidad de Deusto, 2006.
  • Beorlegui, Carlos . “La Filosofía de Jd García Bacca.” Isegoría, no. 7 (1993): 151-64.
  • Bolívar, Simón. El Libertador: Writings of Simón Bolívar. Translated by Frederick H. Fornoff. Edited by David Bushnell. New York: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Bondy, Augusto Salazar. ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra américa? México: Siglo XXI, 1968.
  • Burke, Janet, and Ted Humphrey, eds. Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
  • Cerutti Guldberg, Horacio. Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana. México: Fondo de Cultura Económica, 2006.
  • Chasteen, John Charles. Born in Blood & Fire: A Concise History of Latin America. New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 2011.
  • Costa, João Cruz. A History of Ideas in Brazil: The Development of Philosophy in Brazil and the Evolution of National History. Translated by Suzette Macedo. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964.
  • Crawford, William Rex. A Century of Latin-American Thought. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1961.
  • de la Cruz, Sor Juana Inés. The Answer / La Respuesta. Edited and Translated by Electa Arenal and Amanda Powell. New York: Feminist Press at the City University of New York, 2009.
  • de las Casas, Bartolomé. In Defense of the Indians. Translated by Stafford Poole. DeKalb: Northern Illinois University Press, 1992.
  • Dussel, Enrique. Ethics of Liberation: In the Age of Globalization and Exclusion. Translated by Alejandro A. Vallega and Eduardo Mendieta. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2013.
  • Dussel, Enrique . Philosophy of Liberation. Translated by Aquilina Martinez and Christine Morkovsky. Eugene, OR: Wipf & Stock Publishers, 1980.
  • Dussel, Enrique . Politics of Liberation: A Critical Global History. Translated by Thia Cooper. Canterbury: SCM Press, 2011.
  • Dussel, Enrique, Eduardo Mendieta, and Carmen Bohórquez, eds. El pensamiento filosofico latinoamericano, del Caribe y “latino” (1300-2000): historia, corrientes, temas y filósofos. México: Siglo XXI, 2009.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio. Ignacio Ellacuria: Essays on History, Liberation, and Salvation. Edited by Michael E. Lee. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis Books, 2013.
  • Femenías, María Luisa, and Amy A. Oliver, eds. Feminist Philosophy in Latin America and Spain. New York: Rodopi, 2007.
  • Fornet-Betancourt, Raúl. Transformación intercultural de la filosofía: ejercicios teóricos y prácticos de filosofía intercultural desde latinoamérica en el contexto de la globalización. Bilbao: Desclée de Brouwer, 2001.
  • Freire, Paulo. Pedagogy of the Oppressed. Translated by Myra Bergman Ramos. New York: Herder and Herder, 1970.
  • García Bacca, Juan David. Antología del pensamiento filosófico venezolano. Caracas: Ediciones del Ministerio de Educación, 1954.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E. Hispanic / Latino Identity: A Philosophical Perspective. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 1999.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E., ed. Latin American Philosophy Today. A Special Double Issue of The Philosophical Forum. Vol. 20:1-2, 1988-89.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E.. Philosophical Analysis in Latin America. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1984.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E., and Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert. Latin American Philosophy for the 21st Century: The Human Condition, Values, and the Search for Identity. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2004.
  • Guaman Poma de Ayala, Felipe The First New Chronicle and Good Government [Abridged]. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 2006.
  • Hierro, Graciela. Ética y feminismo. México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 1985.
  • Hierro, Graciela . La ética del placer. México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 2001.
  • Ivan, Marquez, ed. Contemporary Latin American Social and Political Thought: An Anthology. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2008.
  • Mariátegui, José Carlos. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality. Translated by Marjory Urquidi. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1971.
  • Martí, José. José Martí Reader: Writings on the Americas. Edited by Deborah Scnookal and Mirta Muñiz. Melbourne: Ocean Press, 2007.
  • Mendieta, Eduardo, ed. Latin American Philosophy: Currents, Issues, Debates. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003.
  • Mignolo, Walter D. The Darker Side of the Renaissance: Literacy, Territoriality, and Colonization. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1995.
  • Mignolo, Walter D . The Idea of Latin America. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2005.
  • Moraña, Mabel, Enrique Dussel, and Carlos A. Jáuregui, eds. Coloniality at Large: Latin America and the Postcolonial Debate. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2008.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana, Ofelia Schutte, and Otávio Bueno, eds. A Companion to Latin American Philosophy. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2010.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana, and Gary Seay. Latin American Philosophy: An Introduction with Readings. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson, 2003.
  • Nuccetelli, Susanna. Latin American Thought: Philosophical Problems and Arguments. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2002.
  • Portilla, Miguel León. Aztec Thought and Culture: A Study of the Ancient Nahuatl Mind. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963.
  • Rodó, José Enrique. Ariel. Translated by Margaret Sayers Peden. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1988.
  • Salles, Arleen, and Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert. The Role of History in Latin American Philosophy: Contemporary Perspectives. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2006.
  • Sánchez Reulet, Aníbal. Contemporary Latin American Philosophy: A Selection with Introduction and Notes. Translated by Willard R. Trask. Albuquerque: The University of New Mexico Press, 1954.
  • Schutte, Ofelia. Cultural Identity and Social Liberation in Latin American Thought. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1993.
  • Schutte, Ofelia, and María Luisa Femenías. “Feminist Philosophy.” In A Companion to Latin American Philosophy, edited by Susana Nuccetelli, Ofelia Schutte and Otávio Bueno. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2010.
  • Sierra, Justo. The Political Evolution of the Mexican People. Translated by Charles Ramsdell. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1976.
  • Vasconcelos, José. The Cosmic Race: A Bilingual Edition. Translated by Didier T. Jaén. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997.
  • Vaz Ferreira, Carlos. Sobre feminismo. Buenos Aires: Editorial Losada, 1945.
  • Zea, Leopoldo. The Latin-American Mind. Translated by James H. Abbott and Lowell Dunham. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . Latin America and the World. Translated by Beatrice Berler and Frances Kellam Hendricks. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1969.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . Positivism in Mexico. Translated by Josephine H. Schulte. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1974.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . The Role of the Americas in History. Translated by Sonja Karsen. Edited by Amy A. Oliver. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1991.


Author Information

Alexander V. Stehn
University of Texas-Pan American
U. S. A.

Metaphor and Phenomenology

Metaphor and Phenomenology

 The term “contemporary phenomenology” refers to a wide area of 20th and 21st century philosophy in which the study of the structures of consciousness occupies center stage. Since the appearance of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason and subsequent developments in phenomenology and hermeneutics after Husserl, it has no longer been possible to view consciousness as a simple scientific object of study. It is, in fact, the precondition for any sort of meaningful experience, even the simple apprehension of objects in the world. While the basic features of phenomenological consciousness – intentionality, self-awareness, embodiment, and so forth—have been the focus of analysis, Continental philosophers such as Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida go further in adding a linguistically creative dimension. They argue that metaphor and symbol act as the primary interpreters of reality, generating richer layers of perception, expression, and meaning in speculative thought. The interplay of metaphor and phenomenology introduces serious challenges and ambiguities within long-standing assumptions in the history of Western philosophy, largely with respect to the strict divide between the literal and figurative modes of reality based in the correspondence theory of truth. Since the end of the 20th century, the role of metaphor in the production of cognitive structures has been taken up and extended in new productive directions, including “naturalized phenomenology” and straightforward cognitive science, notably in the work of G. Lakoff and M. Johnson, M. Turner, D. Zahavi, and S. Gallagher.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview
    1. The Conventional View: Aristotle’s Contribution to Substitution Model
    2. The Philosophical Issues
    3. Nietzsche’s Role in Development of Phenomenological Theories of Metaphor
  2. The Phenomenological Theory in Continental Philosophy
    1. Phenomenological Method: Husserl
    2. Heidegger’s Contribution
  3. Existential Phenomenology: Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics, and Metaphor
    1. The Mechanics of Conceptual Blending
    2. The Role of Kant’s Schematism in Conceptual Blending
  4. Jacques Derrida: Metaphor as Metaphysics
    1. The Dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida
  5. Anglo-American Philosophy: Interactionist Theories
  6. Metaphor, Phenomenology, and Cognitive Science
    1. The Embodied Mind
    2. The Literary Mind
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Overview

This article highlights the definitive points in the ongoing philosophical conversation about metaphorical language and it’s centrality in phenomenology. The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, at times presented as a critique, is a radical alternative to the conventional analysis of metaphor. The conventional view, largely inherited from Aristotle, is also known as the “substitution model.” In the traditional, or standard approach, the uses and applications of metaphor have been restricted to (along with other related symbolic phenomena/tropes) the realms of rhetoric and poetics. In this view, metaphor is none other than a kind of categorical mistake, a deviance of sense produced in order to create a lively effect.

While somewhat contested, the standard substitution theory, also referred to as the “similarity theory,” generally defines metaphor as a stylistic literary device involving a deviant and dyadic movement which shifts meaning from one word to another. This view, first and most thoroughly articulated by Aristotle, reinforces the epistemic primacy of the literal, where metaphor can only operate as a secondary device, one which is dependent on the prior level of ordinary descriptive language, where the first-order language in itself contains nothing metaphorical. In most cases, the relation between two orders, literal and figurative, has been interpreted as an implicit simile, which expresses a “this is that” structure. For example, Aristotle mentions, in Poetics: 

When the poet says of Achilles that he “Leapt on the foe as a lion,” this is a simile; when he says of him, “the lion leapt” it is a metaphor—here, since both are courageous, [Homer] has transferred to Achilles the name of “lion.” (1406b 20-3)

In purely conventional terms, poetic language can only be said to refer to itself; that is, it can accomplish imaginative description through metaphorical attribution, but the description does not refer to any reality outside of itself. For the purposes of traditional rhetoric and poetics in the Aristotelian mode, metaphor may serve many purposes; it can be clever, creative, or eloquent, but never true in terms of referring to new propositional content. This is due to the restriction of comparison to substitution, such that the cognitive impact of the metaphoric transfer of meaning is produced by assuming similarities between literal and figurative domains of objects and the descriptive predicates attributed to them.

The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, however, not only challenges the substitution model, it advances the role of metaphor far beyond the limits of traditional rhetoric. In the Continental philosophical tradition, the most extensive developments of metaphor’s place in phenomenology are found in the work of Martin Heidegger, Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida. They all, in slightly different ways, see figurative language as the primary vehicle for the disclosure and creation of new forms of meaning which emerge from an ontological, rather than purely epistemic or objectifying engagement with the world.

a. The Conventional View: Aristotle’s Contribution to Substitution Model

Metaphor consists in giving the thing a name that belongs to something else; the transference being either from species to genus, or from genus to species, or from species to species, on the grounds of analogy. (Poetics 1457b 6-9)

 While his philosophical predecessor Plato condemns the use of figurative speech for its role in rhetorike, “the art of persuasion,” Aristotle recognizes its stylistic merits and provides us with the first systematic analysis of metaphor and its place in literature and the mimetic arts. His briefer descriptions of how metaphors are to be used can be found in Rhetoric and Poetics, while his extended analysis of how metaphor operates within the context of language as a whole can be inferred by reading On Interpretation together with Metaphysics. The descriptive use of metaphor can be understood as an extension of its meaning; the term derives from the Greek metaphora, from metaphero, meaning “to transfer or carry over.” Thus, the figurative trope emerges from a movement of substitution, involving the transference of a word to a new sense, one which compares or juxtaposes seemingly unrelated subjects.  For example, in Shakespeare’s Sonnet 73:

In me thou seest the glowing of such fire,
That on the ashes of his youth doth lie…

The narrator directly transfers and applies the “dying ember” image in a new “foreign” sense: his own awareness of his waning youth.

This is Aristotle’s contribution to the standard substitution model of metaphor. It is to be understood as a linguistic device, widely applied but remaining within the confines of rhetoric and poetry. Though it does play a central role in social persuasion, metaphor, restricted by the mechanics of similarity and substitution, does not carry with it any speculative or philosophical importance. Metaphors may point out underlying similarities between objects and their descriptive categories, and may instruct through adding liveliness and elegance to speech, but they do not refer, in the strong sense, to a form of propositional knowledge.

The formal structure of substitution operates in the following manner: the first subject or entity under description in one context is characterized as equivalent in some way to the second entity derived from another context; it is either implied or stated that the first entity “is” the second entity in some way. The metaphorical attribution occurs when certain select properties from the second entity are imposed on the first in order to characterize it in some distinctive way. Metaphor relies on pre-existing categories which classify objects and their properties; these categories guide the ascription of predicates to objects, and since metaphor may entail a kind of violation of this order, it cannot itself refer to a “real” class of existing objects or the relations between them. Similarly, in poetry, metaphor serves not as a foundation for knowledge, but as a tool for mimesis or artistic imitation, representing the actions in epic tragedy or mythos in order to move and instruct the emotions of the audience for the purpose of catharsis.

Aristotle’s theory and its significance for philosophy can only be fully understood in terms of the wider context of denotation and reference which supports the classical realist epistemology. Metaphor is found within his taxonomy of speech forms; additionally, simile is subordinate to metaphor and both are figures of speech falling under the rubric of lexis/diction, which itself is composed of individual linguistic units or noun-names and verbs. Lexis operates within the unity of logos, meaning that the uses of various forms of speech must conform to the overall unity of language and reason, held together by categorical structures of being found in Aristotle’s metaphysics.

As a result of Aristotle’s combined thinking in these works, it turns out that the ostensive function of naming individual objects (“this” name standing for “this object” or property) allows for the clear demarcation between the literal and figurative meanings for names. Thus, the noun-name can work as a signifier of meaning in two domains, the literal and the non-literal. However, there remains an unresolved problem: the categorical nature of the boundary between literal and figurative domains will be a point of contention for many contemporary critiques of the theory coming from phenomenological philosophy.

Furthermore, the denotative theory has served in support of the referential function of language, one which assumes a system of methodological connections between language, sense perceptions, mental states, and the external world. The referential relation between language and its objects serves the correspondence theory of truth, in that the truth-bearing capacity of language corresponds to valid perception and cognition of the external world. The theory assumes that these sets of correspondences allow for the consistent and reliable relation of reference between words, images, and objects.

Aristotle accounts for this kind of correspondence in the following way: sense perceptions’s pathemata give rise to the psychological states in which object representations are formed. These states are actually likenesses (isomorphisms) of the external objects. Thus, names for things refer to the things themselves, mental representations of those things, and to the class-based meanings.

If, as Aristotle assumes, the meaning of metaphor rests on the level of the noun-name, its distinguishing feature lies in its deviation, a “something which happens” to the noun/name by virtue of a transfer (epiphora) of meaning. Here, Aristotle creates a metaphor (based on physical movement) in order to explain metaphor. The term “phora” refers to a change in location from one place to another, to which is added the prefix “epi:” epiphora refers then to the transfer of the common proper name of the thing to the new, unfamiliar, alien (allotrios) place or object. Furthermore, the transference (or substitution), borrowing as it does the alien name for the thing, does not disrupt the overall unity of meaning or logical order of correspondence within the denotative system; all such movement remains within the classifications of genus and species.

The metaphoric transfer of meaning will become a significant point of debate and speculation in later philosophical discussions. Although Aristotle himself does not explore the latent philosophical questions in his own theory, subsequent philosophers of language have over the years recast these issues, exploring the challenges to meaning, reference, and correspondence that present themselves in the substitution theory. What happens, on these various levels, when we substitute one object or descriptor of a “natural kind,” to a foreign object domain? It may the be the case that metaphorical transference calls into question the limits of all meaning-bearing categories, and in turn, the manner in which words can be said to “refer” to specific objects and their attributes. By virtue of the epiphoric movement, species and genus attributes of disparate objects fall into relations of kinship, opposition, or deviation among the various ontological categories. These relations allow for the metaphoric novelty which will subsequently fuel the development of alternative theories, those which view as fundamental to our cognitive or conceptual processes. At this point the analysis of metaphor opens up the philosophical space for further debate and interpretation.

b. The Philosophical Issues

In any theory of metaphor, there are significant philosophical implications for the transfer of meaning from one object-domain or context of associations to another. The metaphor, unlike its sister-trope the analogy, creates a new form of predication, suggesting that one category or class of objects (with certain characteristics) can be projected onto another separate class of entities; this projection may require a blurring of the ontological and epistemological distinctions between the kinds of objects that can be said to exist, either in the mind or in the external world. Returning to the Shakespearean metaphor above, what are the criteria that we use to determine whether a dying ember aptly fits the state of the narrator’s consciousness? What are the perceptual and ontological connections between fire and human existence? The first problem lies in how we are to explain the initial “fit” between any predicate category and its objects. Another problem comes to the forefront when we try to account for how metaphors enable us to think in new ways. If we are to move beyond the standard substitution model, we are compelled to investigate the specific mental operations that enable us to create metaphoric representations; we need to elaborate upon the processes which connect particular external objects (and their properties) given to sensory experience to linguistic signs “referring” to a new kind of object, knowledge context, or domain of experience.

According to the standard model, a metaphor’s ability to signify is restricted by ordinary denotation. The metaphor, understood as a new name, is conceived as a function of individual terms, rather than sentences or wider forms of discourse (narratives, texts). As Continental phenomenology develops in the late 19th and 20th centuries, we are presented with radically alternative theories which obscure strict boundaries between the literal and the figurative, disrupting the connections between perception, language, and thought. Namely, the phenomenological, interactionist, and cognitive treatments of metaphor defend the view that metaphorical language and symbol serve as indirect routes to novel ways of knowing and describing human experience. In their own ways, these theories will call into question the validity and usefulness of correspondence and reference, especially in theoretical disciplines such as philosophy, theology, literature, and science.

Although this article largely focuses on explicating phenomenological theories of metaphor, it should be noted that in all three theories mentioned above, metaphor is displaced from its formerly secondary position in substitution theory to occupying the front and center of our cognitive capabilities. Understood as the product of intentional structures in the mind, metaphor now becomes conceptual, rather than merely ornamental, acting as a conduit through which we take apart and re-assemble the concepts we use to describe the varieties and nuances of experience. They all share in the assumption that metaphors suggest, posit, or disclose similarities between objects and domains of experience (where there seem to be none), without explicitly recognizing that a comparison is being made between two sometimes very different kinds of things or events. These theories, when applied to our original metaphor (“in me thou seest…”) contend that at times, there need not be any explicit similarity between states of awareness or existence as “fire” or “ashes”.

c. Nietzsche’s Role in Development of Phenomenological Theories of Metaphor

In Nietzsche’s thought we see an early turning away from the substitution theory and its reliance on the correspondence theory of truth, denotation, and reference. His description of metaphor takes us back to its primordial “precognitive” or ontological origins; Nietzsche acts here as a pre-cursor to later developments, yet in itself his analysis offers a compelling account of the power of metaphor. Though his remarks on metaphor are somewhat scattered, they can be found in the early writings of 1872-74, Nachgelassene Fragmente, and “On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense” (see W. Kaufman’s translation in The Portable Nietzsche). Together with the “Rhetorik” lectures, these writings argue for a genealogical explanation of the conceptual, displacing traditional philosophical categories into the metaphorical realm. In doing so, he deconstructs our conventional reliance on the idea that meaningful language must reflect a system of logical correspondences.

With correspondence, we can only assume we are in possession of the truth when our representations or ideas about the world “match up” with external states of affairs. We have already seen how Aristotle’s system of first-order predication supports correspondence, as it is enabled through the denotative ascription of predicates/categorical features of /to objects. But Nietzsche boldly suggests that we are, from the outset, already in metaphor and he works from this starting point. The concepts and judgments we use to describe reality do not flatly reflect pre-existing similarities or causal relationships between themselves and our physical intuitions about reality, they are themselves metaphorical constructions; that is, they are creative forms of differentiation emerging out of a deeper undifferentiated primordiality of being. The truth of the world is more closely reflected in the Dionysian level of pure aesthetic immersion into an “undecipherable” innermost essence of things.

Even in his early work, The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche rejects the long-held assumption that truth is an ordering of concepts expressed through rigid linguistic categories, putting forth the alternative view which gives primacy to symbol as the purest, most elemental form of representation. That which is and must be expressed is produced organically, out of the flux of nature and yielding a “becoming” rather than being.

In the Dionysian dithyramb man is incited to the greatest exaltation of all his symbolic faculties; something never before experienced struggles for utterance—the annihilation of the veil of maya, … oneness as the soul of the race and of nature itself. The essence of nature is now to be expressed symbolically; we need a new world of symbols.… (BOT Ch. 2)

Here, following Schopenhauer, he reverses Aristotelian transference of concept-categories from the literal to the figurative, and makes the figurative the original mode for representation of experience. The class terms “species” and “genus”, based in Aristotle and so important in classical and medieval epistemology, only appear to originate and validate themselves in “dialectics and through scientific reflection.” For Nietzsche, the categories hide their real nature, abiding as frozen metaphors which reflect previously experienced levels of natural experience metaphorically represented in our consciousness. They emerge through construction indirectly based in vague images or names for things, willed into being out of the unnamed flowing elements of biological existence. Even Thales the pre-Socratic, we are reminded, in his attempt to give identity to the underlying unity of all things, falls back on a conceptualization of it as water without realizing he is using a metaphor.

Once we construct and begin to apply our concepts, their metaphorical origins are forgotten or concealed from ordinary awareness. This theoretical process is but another attempt to restore “the also-forgotten” original unity of being. The layering of metaphors, the archeological ancestors of concepts, is specifically linked to our immediate experiential capacity to transcend the proper and the individual levels of experience and linguistic signs. We cannot, argues Nietzsche, construct metaphors without breaking out of the confines of singularity, thus we must reject the artificiality of designating separate names for separate things. To assume that an individual name would completely and transparently describe its referent (in perception) is to also assume that language and external experience mirror one another in some perfect way. It is rather the case that language transfers meaning from place to place. The terms metapherein and Übertragung are equivalently applied here; if external experience is in constant flux, it is not possible to reduplicate exact and individual meanings. To re-describe things through metaphor is to “leave out” and “carry-over” meaning, to undergo a kind of dispossession of self, thing, place, and time and an overcoming of both individualisms and dualities. Thus the meaningful expression of the real is seen and experienced most directly in the endlessly creative activity of art and music, rather than philosophy.

2. The Phenomenological Theory in Continental Philosophy

Versions of Nietzsche’s “metaphorization” of thought will reappear in the Continental philosophers described below; those who owe their phenomenological attitudes to Husserl, but disagree with his transcendental idealization of meaning, one which demands that we somehow separate the world of experience from the essential meanings of objects in that world. Taken together, these philosophers call into question the position that truth entails a relationship of correspondence between dual aspects of reality, one internal to our minds and the other external. We consider Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida as the primary examples. For Heidegger, metaphoric language signals a totality or field of significance in which being discloses or reveals itself. Ricoeur’s work, in turn, builds upon aspects of Heidegger’s ontological hermeneutics, explicating how it is the case that metaphors drive speculative reflection. In Ricoeur’s model, the literal level is subverted, and metaphoric language and symbols containing “semantic kernels” create structures of double reference in all figurative forms of discourse. These structures point beyond themselves in symbols and texts, serving as mediums which reveal new worlds of meaning and existential possibilities.

French philosopher Jacques Derrida, on the other hand, reiterates the Nietzschean position; metaphor does not subvert metaphysics, but rather is itself the hidden source of all conceptual structures.

a. Phenomenological Method: Husserl

Edmund Husserl’s phenomenological method laid the groundwork, in the early 20th century, for what would eventually take shape in the phenomenological philosophies of Martin Heidegger, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Jean-Paul Sartre. Husserl’s early work provides the foundation for exploring how these modes of presentation convey the actual meaningful contents of experience. He means to address here the former distinction made by Kant between the phenomenal appearances of the real (to consciousness) and the noumenal reality of the things-in-themselves. Husserl, broadly speaking, seeks to resolve not only what some see as a problematic dualism in Kant, but also some philosophical problems that accompany Hegel’s constructivist phenomenology.

Taken in its entirety, Husserl’s project demonstrates a major shift in the 20th century phenomenology, seeking a rigorous method for the description and analysis of consciousness and the contents given to it. He intends his method to be the scientific grounding for philosophy; it is to be a critique of psychologism and a return to a universal knowledge of “the things themselves,” those intelligible objects apprehended by and given to consciousness.

In applying this method we seek, Husserl argues, a scientific foundation for universally objective knowledge; adhering to the “pure description” of phenomena given to consciousness through the perception of objects. If those objects are knowable, it is because they are immediate in conscious experience. It is through the thorough description of these objects as they appear to us in terms of color, shape, and so forth, that we apprehend that which is essential – what we call “essences” or meanings. Here, the act of description is a method for avoiding a metaphysical trap: that of imposing these essences or object meanings onto the contents of mental experience. Noesis, for Husserl, achieves its aim by including within itself (giving an account of) the role that context or horizon plays in delineating possible objects for experience. This will have important implications for later phenomenological theories of metaphor, in that metaphors may be said intend new figurative contexts in which being appears to us in new ways.

In Ideen (30), Husserl explains how such a horizon or domain of experience presents a set of criteria for us to apply. We choose and identify an object as a single member of a class of objects, and so these regions of subjective experience, also called regions of phenomena, circumscribe certain totalities or generic unities to which concrete items belong. In order to understand the phenomenological approach to meaning-making, it is first necessary to clarify what we mean by “phenomenological description,” as it is described in Logical Investigations. Drawing upon the work of Brentano and Meinong, Husserl develops a set of necessary structural relations between the knower (ego), the objects of experience, and the horizon within which those objects are given. The relation is characterized in an axiomatic manner as intentionality, where the subjective consciousness and its objects are correlates brought together in a psychological act. Subjectivity contributes to and makes possible cognition; specifically, it must be the case that perception and cognition are always about something given in the stream of consciousness, they are only possible because consciousness intends or refers to these immanent objects. As we shall presently see, the intentional nature of consciousness applies to Ricoeur’s hermeneutics of the understanding, bestowing metaphor with a special ability to expand (to nearly undermining) the structure of reference in a non-literal sense to an existential state.

Husserl’s stage like development of phenomenology unveils the structure of intentionality as derived from the careful description of certain mental acts. Communicable linguistic expressions, such as names and sentences, exist only in so far as they exhibit intentional meanings for speakers. Written or spoken expressions only carry references to objects because they have meanings for speakers and knowers. If we examine all of our mental perceptions, we find it impossible to think without intending an object of some sort. Both Continental and Anglo-American thinkers agree that metaphor holds the key to understanding these processes, as it re-organizes our senses of perception, temporality, and relation of subject to object, referring to these as subjects of existential concern and possibility.

b. Heidegger’s Contribution

Heidegger, building upon the phenomenological thematic, asserts that philosophical analysis should keep to careful description of the human encounter with the world, revealing the modes in which being is existentially or relationally given. This signals both a nod to and departure from Husserl, leading to a rethinking of phenomenology which replaces the theoretical apprehension of meaning with an “uncovering” of being as it is lived out in experiential contexts or horizons. Later, Ricoeur will draw on Heidegger’s “existentialized” intentionality as he characterizes the referential power of metaphors to signal those meanings waiting to be “uncovered’ by Dasein’s (human as being-there) experience of itself – in relation to others, and to alternate worlds of possibility.

As his student, Heidegger owes to Husserl the phenomenological intent to capture “the things themselves” (die Sachen selbst), however, the Heideggerian project outlined in Being and Time rejects the attempt to establish phenomenology as a science of the structures of consciousness and reforms it in ontologically disclosive or manifestational terms. Heidegger’s strong attraction to the hermeneutic tradition in part originates in his dialogue with Wilhem Dilthey, the 19th century thinker who stressed the importance of historical consciousness attitude in guiding the work of the social sciences and hermeneutics, directed toward the understanding of primordial experience. Dilthey’s influence on Heidegger and Ricoeur (as well as Gadamer) is evident, in that all recognize the historical life of humans as apprehended in the study of the text (a form of spirit), particularly those containing metaphors and narratives conveying a lived, concrete experience of religious life.

Heidegger rejects the notion that the structures of consciousness are internally maintained as transcendentally subjective and also directed towards their transcendental object. Phenomenology must now be tied to the problems of human existence, and must then direct itself immediately towards the lived world and allow this “beholding” of the world to guide the work of “its own uncovering.”

Heidegger argues for a return to the original Greek definitions of the terms phainonmenon (derived from phainesthai, or “that which shows itself”) and logos. Heidegger adopts these terms for his own purposes, utilizing them to reinforce the dependence of ontological disclosure or presence: those beings showing themselves or letting themselves be “seen-as.” The pursuit of aletheia, (“truth as recovering of the forgotten aspects of being”) is now fulfilled through adherence to a method of self-interpretation achieved from the standpoint of Dasein’s (humanity’s) subjectivity, which has come to replace the transcendental ego of Kant and Husserl.

The turn to language, in this case, must be more than simple communication between persons; it is a primordial feature of subjectivity. Language is to be the interpretive medium of the understanding through which all forms of being present themselves to subjective apprehension. In this way, Heidegger replaces the transcendental version of phenomenology with the disclosive, where the structure of interpretation provides further insight into his ontological purposes of the understanding.

3. Existential Phenomenology: Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics, and Metaphor

The linguistic turn in phenomenology has been most directly applied to metaphor in the works of Paul Ricoeur, who revisits Husserlian and Heideggerian themes in his extensive treatment of metaphor. He extends his analysis of metaphor into a fully developed discursive theory of symbol, focusing on those found in religious texts and sacred narratives. His own views follow from what he thinks are overly limited structuralist theories of symbol, which, in essence, do not provide a theory of linguistic reference useful for his own hermeneutic project. For Ricoeur, a proper theory of metaphor understands it to be “a re-appropriation of our effort to exist,” echoing Nietszche’s call to go back to the primordiality of being. Metaphor must then include the notion that such language is expressive and constitutive of the being of those who embark on philosophical reflection.

Much of Ricoeur’s thought can be characterized by his well-known statement “the symbol gives rise to the thought.” Ricoeur shares Heidegger’s and Husserl’s assumptions: we reflectively apprehend or grasp the structures of human experience as they are presented to temporalized subjective consciousness While the “pure” phenomenology of Husserl seeks a transparent description of experience as it is lived out in phases or moments, Ricoeur, also following Nietzsche, centers the creation of meaning in the existential context. The noetic act originates in the encounter with a living text, constituting “a horizon of possibilities,” for the meaning of existence, thus abandoning the search for essences internal to the objects we experience in the world.

His foundational work in The Symbolism of Evil and The Rule of Metaphor places the route to human understanding concretely, via symbolic expressions which allow for the phenomenological constitution, reflection, and re-appropriation of experience. These processes are enabled by the structure of “seeing-as,” adding to Heidegger’s insight with the metaphoric acting as a “refiguring” of that which is given to consciousness. At various points he enters into conversation with Max Black and Nelson Goodman, among others, who also recognize the cognitive contributions to science and art found in the models and metaphors. In Ricoeur’s case, sacred metaphors display the same second-order functions shared by those in the arts and sciences, but with a distinctively ontological emphasis: “the interpretation of symbols is worthy of being called a hermeneutics only insofar as it is a part of self-understanding and of the understanding of being” (COI 30).

In The Rule of Metaphor, Ricoeur, departing from Aristotle, locates the signifying power of metaphor primarily at the level of the sentence, not individual terms. Metaphor is to be understood as a discursive linguistic act which achieves its purpose through extended predication rather than simple substitution of names. Ricoeur, like so many language philosophers, argues that Aristotelian substitution is incomplete; it does not go far enough in accounting for the semantic, syntactic, logical, and ontological issues that accompany the creation of a metaphor. The standard substitution model cannot do justice to potential for metaphor create meaning by working in tandem with propositional thought-structures (sentences). To these ends, Ricoeur’s study in The Rule of Metaphor replaces substitution and strict denotative theories with a theory of language that works through a structure of double reference.

Taking his lead while diverging from Aristotle, Ricoeur reads the metaphorical transfer of a name as a kind of “category mistake” which produces an imaginative construction about the new way objects may be related to one another. He expands this dynamic of “meaning transfer” on to the level of the sentence, then text, enabling the production of a second-order discursive level of thinking whereby all forms of symbolic language become phenomenological disclosures of being.

The discussion begins with the linguistic movement of epiphora (transfer of names-predicates) taken from an example in Poetics. A central dynamic exists in transposing one term, with one set of meaning-associations onto another. Citing Aristotle’s own example of “sowing around a god-created flame,”

If A = light of the sun, B = action of the sun, C = grain, and D = sowing, then

B is to A, as D is to C

We see action of the sun is to light as sowing is to grain, however, B is a vague action term (sun’s action) which is both missing and implied; Ricoeur calls this a “nameless act” which establishes a similar relation to the object, sunlight, as sowing is to the grain. In this act the phenomenological space for the creation of new meaning is opened up, precisely because we cannot find a conventional word to take the place of a metaphorical word. The nameless act implies that the transfer of an alien name entails more than a simple substitution of concepts, and is therefore said to be logically disruptive.

a. The Mechanics of Conceptual Blending

The “nameless act” entails a kind of “cognitive leap:’’ since there is no conventional term for B, the act does not involve substituting a decorative term in its place. Rather, a new meaning association has been created through the semantic gap between the objects. The absence of the original literal term, the “semantic void”, cannot be filled without the creation of a metaphor which signals the larger discursive context of the sentence and eventually, the text. If, as above, the transfer of predicates (the sowing of grain as casting of flames) challenges the “rules” of meaning dictated by ostensive theory, we are forced to make a new connection where there was none, between the conventional and metaphorical names for the object. For Ricoeur, the figurative (sowing around a flame) acts as hermeneutic medium in that it negates and displaces the original term, signifying a “new kind of object” which is in fact a new form (logos) of being. The metaphorical statement allows us to say that an object is and is not what we usually call it. The sense-based aspect is then “divorced” from predication and subsequently, logos is emptied of its objective meaning; the new object may be meaningful but not clear under the conditions of strict denotation or natural knowledge.

We take note that the “new object” (theoretically speaking) has more than figurative existence; the newly formed subject-predicate relation places the copula at the center of the name-object (ROM 18). Ricoeur’s objective is to create a dialectically driven process which produces a new ‘object-domain’ or category of being. Following the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung, (through the aforementioned negation and displacement) the new name has opened up a new field of meaning to be re-appropriated into our reflective consciousness. This is how Ricoeur deconstructs first-order reference in order to develop an ontology of sacred language based on second-order reference.

We are led to the view that myths are modes of discourse whose meanings are phenomenological spaces of openness, creating a nearly infinite range of interpretations. Thus we see how metaphor enables being, as Aristotle notes, to “be said in many ways.”

Ricoeur argues that second-order discursivity “violates” the pre-existing first order of genus and species, in turn causing a kind of upheaval among further relations and rules set by the categories: namely subordination, coordination, proportionality or equality among object properties. Something of a unity of being remains, yet for Ricoeur this non-generic unity or enchainement, corresponds to a single generic context referring to “Being,” restricting the senses or applications of transferred predicates in the metaphoric context.

b. The Role of Kant’s Schematism in Conceptual Blending

The notion of a “non-generic unity” raises, perhaps, more philosophical problems than it answers. How are we to explain the mechanics which blend descriptors from one object domain and its sets of perceptions, to a domain of foreign objects? Ricoeur addresses the epistemic issues surrounding the transfer of names from one category to another in spatiotemporal experience by importing Kant’s theory of object construction, found in the Critique of Pure Reason. In the “Transcendental Schematism”, Kant establishes the objective validity of the conceptual categories we use to synthesize the contents of experience. In this section, Kant elevates the Aristotelian categories from grammatical principles to formal structures intrinsic to reason. Here, he identifies an essential problem for knowledge: how are we to conceive a relationship between these pure concept-categories of the understanding and the sensible objects given to us in space and time? With the introduction of the schematism, Kant seeks a resolution to the various issues inherent to the construction of mental representations (a position shared by contemporary cognitive scientists; see below). For Ricoeur, this serves to answer the problem of how metaphoric representations of reality can actually “refer” to reality (even if only at the existential level of experience).

Kant states “the Schematism” is a “sensible condition under which alone pure concepts of the understanding can be employed” (CPR/A 136). Though the doctrine is sometimes said to be notoriously confusing due to its circular nature, the schemata are meant as a distinctive set of mediating representations, rules, or operators in the mind which themselves display the universal and necessary characteristics of sensible objects; these characteristics are in turn synthesized and unified by the activity of the transcendental imagination.

In plainer terms, the schematic function is used by the imagination to guide it in the construction of images. It does not seem to be any kind of picture of an object, but rather the “form” or “listing” of how we produce the picture. For Ricoeur, the schematism lends the structural support for assigning an actual truth-value or cognitive contribution to the semantic innovation produced by metaphor. The construction of new meaning via new forms of predication entails a re-organization and re-interpretation of pre-existing forms, and the operations of the productive imagination enable the entire process.

In the work Figuring the Sacred, for example, Ricoeur, answering to his contemporary Mircea Eliade ( The Sacred and The Profane), moves metaphor beyond the natural “boundedness” of myths and symbols. While these manifest meaning, they are still constrained in that they must mirror the natural cosmic order of things. Metaphor, on the other hand, occupies the center of a “hermeneutic of proclamation;” it has the power to proclaim because it is a “free invention of discourse.” Ricoeur specifically explicates biblical parables, proverbs, and eschatological statements as extended metaphorical processes. Thus, “The Kingdom of God will not come with signs that you can observe. Do not say, ‘It is here; it is there.’ Behold the kingdom of God is among you” (Luke 17:20-21). This saying creates meaning by breaking down our ordinary or familiar temporal frameworks applied to interpretation of signs (of the kingdom). The quest for signs is, according to Ricoeur, “overthrown” for the sake of “a completely new existential signification” (FS 59).

This discussion follows from the earlier work in The Rule of Metaphor, where the mechanics of representation behind this linguistic act of “re-description” are further developed. The act points us towards a novel ontological domain of human possibility, enabled through new cognitive content. The linguistic act of creating a metaphor in essence becomes a hermeneutic act directed towards a gap which must be bridged, that between the abstract (considerations of reflection) understanding (Verstehen) and the finite living out of life. In this way Ricoeur’s theory, often contrasted with that of Derrida, takes metaphor beyond the mechanics of substitution.

4. Jacques Derrida: Metaphor as Metaphysics

In general, Derrida's deconstructive philosophy can be read as a radically alternative way of reading philosophical texts and arguments, viewing them in a novel way through the lens of a rhetorical methodology. This will amount to the taking apart of established ways in which philosophers define perception, concept formation, meaning, and reference.

Derrida, from the outset, will call into question the assumption that the formation of concepts (logos) somehow escapes the primordiality of language and the fundamentally metaphorical-mythical nature of philosophical discourse. In a move which goes much further than Ricoeur, Derrida argues for what Guiseseppe Stellardi so aptly calls the “reverse metaphorization of concepts.” The reversal is such that there can be no final separation between the linguistic-metaphorical and the philosophical realms. These domains are co-constitutive of one another, in the sense that either one cannot be fully theorized or made to fully or transparently explain the meaning of the other. The result is that language acquires a certain obscurity, ascendancy, and autonomy. It will permanently elude our attempts to fix its meaning-making activity in foundational terms which necessitate a transcendent or externalized (to language) unified being.

Derrida's White Mythology offers a penetrating critique of the common paradigm involving the nature of concepts, posing the following questions: “Is there metaphor in the text of philosophy, and if so, how?” Here, the history of philosophy is characterized as an economy, a kind of "usury" where meaning and valuation are understood as metaphorical processes involving “gain and loss.” The process is represented through Derrida’s well-known image of the coin:

I was thinking how the Metaphysicians, when they make a language for themselves, are like … knife-grinders, who instead of knives and scissors, should put medals and coins to the grindstone to efface … the value… When they have worked away till nothing is visible in these crown pieces, neither King Edward, the Emperor William, nor the Republic, they say: 'These pieces have nothing either English, German, or French about them; we have freed them from all limits of time and space; they are not worth five shillings any more ; they are of inestimable value, and their exchange value is extended indefinitely.’ (WM 210).

The “usury” of the sign (the coin) signifies the passage from the physical to the metaphysical. Abstractions now become “worn out” metaphors; they seem like defaced coins, their original, finite values now replaced by a vague or rough idea of the meaning-images that may have been present in the originals.

Such is the movement which simultaneously creates and masks the construction of concepts. Concepts, whose real origins have been forgotten, now only yield an empty sort of philosophical promise – that of “the absolute”, the universalized, unlimited “surplus value” achieved by the eradication of the sensory or momentarily given. Derrida reads this process along a negative Hegelian line: the metaphysicians are most attracted to “concepts in the negative, ab-solute, in-finite, non-Being” (WM 121). That is, their love of the most abstract concept, made that way “by long and universal use”, reveals a preference for the construction of a metaphysics of Being. This is made possible via the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung. The German term refers to a dynamic of sublation where the dialectical, progressive movement of consciousness overcomes and subsumes the particular, concrete singularities of experience through successive moments of cognition. Derrida levels a strong criticism against Hegel’s attempts to overcome difference, arguing that consciousness as understood by Hegel takes on the quality of building an oppressive sort of narrative, subsuming the particular and the momentary under an artificial theoretical gaze. Derrida prefers giving theoretical privilege to the negative; that is, to the systematic negation of all finite determinations of meaning derived from particular aspects of particular beings.

Echoing Heidegger, Derrida conceives of metaphysical constructs as indicative of the Western "logocentric epoch" in philosophy. They depend for their existence on the machinery of binary logic. They remain static due to our adherence to the meaning of ousia (essence), the definition of being based on self-identitical substance, which can only be predicated or expressed in either/or terms. Reference to being, in this case, is constrained within the field of the proper and univocal. Both Heidegger and Derrida, and to some degree Ricoeur seek to free reference from these constraints. Unlike Heidegger, however, Derrida does not work from the assumption that being indicates some unified primordial reality.

For Derrida, there lies hidden within the merely apparent logical unity (with its attendant binary oppositions) or logocentricity of consciousness a white mythology, masking the primitive plurivocity of being which eludes all attempts to name it. Here we find traces of lost meanings, reminiscent of the lost inscriptions on coins. These are “philosophemes,” words, tropes or modes of figuration which do not express ideas or abstract representations of things (grounded in categories), but rather invoke a radically plurivocal notion of meaning. Having thus dismantled the logic of either/or with difference (difference), Derrida gives priority to ambiguity, in “both/and” and “neither/nor” modes of thought and expression. Meaning must then be constituted of and by difference, rather than identity, for difference subverts all preconceived theoretical or ontological structures. It is articulated in the context of all linguistic relations and involves ongoing displacement of a final idealized and unified form of meaning; such displacement reveals through hints and traces, the reality and experience of a disruptive alterity in meaning and being. Alterity is “always already there” by virtue of the presence of the Other.

With the introduction of “the white mythology,” Derrida’s alignment with Nietszche creates a strong opposition to traditional Western theoria. Forms of abstract ideation and theoretical systems representing the oppressive consciousness of the “white man,” built in the name of reason/logos, are in themselves a collection of analogies, existing as colorless dead metaphors whose primitive origins lie in the figurative realms of myths, symbol, and fable.

Derrida's project, resulting as it does in the deconstruction of metaphysics, runs counter to Ricoeur's tensive theory. In contrast to Heidegger’s restrained criticism Derrida’s deconstruction appears to Ricoeur “unbounded.” That is, Ricoeur still assumes a distinction between the speculative and the poetic, where the poetic “drives the speculative” to explicate a surplus of meaning. The surplus, or plurivocity is problematic from Derrida's standpoint. The latter argues that the theory remains logocentric in that it remains true to the binary mode of identity and difference which underlie metaphysical distinctions such as “being and non-being.” For Ricoeur, metaphors create a new space for meaning based on the tension between that which is (can be properly predicated of an object) and that which “is not” (which cannot be predicated of an object). Derrida begs to differ: in the final analysis, there can be no such separation, systematic philosophical theory or set of conceptual structures through which we subsume and “explain” the cognitive or existential value of metaphor.

Derrida's reverse metaphorization of concepts does not support a plurivocal characterization of meaning and being, it does not posit a wider referential field; for Derrida metaphors and concepts remain in a complex, always ambiguous relation to one another. Thus he seems to do away with “reference,” or the distinction between signifier and signified, moving even beyond polysemy (the many potential meaning that words carry). The point here is to preserve the flux of sense and the ongoing dissemination of meaning and otherness.

a. The Dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida

The dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida regarding the referential power of metaphor lies in where they position themselves with regard to Aristotle. Ricoeur's position, in giving priority to the noun-phrase instead of the singular name, challenges Aristotle while still appealing to the original taxonomy (categories) of being based on an architectonic system of predication. For Ricoeur, metaphoric signification mimics the fundamentally equivocal nature of being—we cannot escape the ontological implications of Aristotle’s statement: being can be “said in many ways.” Nevertheless, Ricoeur maintains the distinction between mythos and logos, for we need the tools provided by speculative discourse to explain the polysemic value of metaphors.

Derrida’s deconstruction reaches back to dismantle Aristotle's theory, rooted as it is in the ontology of the proper name/noun (onoma) which signifies a thing as self-identical being (homousion). This, states Derrida, “reassembles and reflects the culture of the West; the white man takes his own mythology, Indo-European mythology, his own logos, that is, the mythos of his idiom, for the universal form of that he must still wish to call Reason” (WM 213).

The original theory makes metaphor yet another link in the logocentric chain—a form of metaphysical oppression. If the value of metaphor is restricted to the transference of names, then metaphor entails a loss or negation of the literal which is still under the confines of a notion of discourse which upholds the traditional formulations of representation and reference in terms of the mimetic and the “proper” which are, in turn, based on a theory of perception (and an attendant metaphysics) that gives priority to resemblance, identity, or what we can call “the law of the same.”

5. Anglo-American Philosophy: Interactionist Theories

Contemporary phenomenological theories of metaphor directly challenge the straightforward theory of reference, replacing the ordinary propositional truth based on denotation with a theory of language which designates and discloses its referents. These interactionist theories carry certain Neo-Kantian features, particularly in the work of the analytic philosophers Nelson Goodman and Max Black. They posit the view that metaphors can reorganize the connections we make between our perceptions of the world. Their theories reflect certain phenomenological assumptions about the ways in which figurative language expands the referential field, allowing for the creation of novel meanings and creating new possibilities for constructing models of reality; in moving between the realms of art and science, metaphors have an interdisciplinary utility. Both Goodman and Black continue to challenge the traditional theory of linguistic reference, offering instead the argument that reference is enabled by the manipulation of predicates in figurative modes of thinking through language.


6. Metaphor, Phenomenology, and Cognitive Science

Recent studies underscore the connections between metaphors, mapping, and schematizing aspects of cognitive organization in mental life. Husserl’s approach to cognition took an anti-naturalist stance, opposed to defining consciousness as an objective entity and therefore unsuited to studying the workings of subjective consciousness; instead his phenomenological stance gave priority to subjectivity, since it constitutes the necessary set of pre-conditions for knowing anything at all as an object or a meaning. Recently, the trend has been renewed and phenomenology has made some productive inroads into the examination of connectionist and embodied approaches to perception, cognition and other sorts of dynamic and adaptive (biological) systems.

Zahavi and Thompson, for example, see strong links between Husserlian phenomenology and philosophy of mind with respect to the phenomena of consciousness, where the constitutive nature of subjective consciousness is clarified specifically in terms of the forms and relations of different kinds of intentional mental states. These involve the unity of temporal experience, the structural relations between intentional mental acts and their objects, and the inherently embodied nature of cognition. Those who study the embodied mind do not all operate in agreement with traditional phenomenological assumptions and methods. Nevertheless, some “naturalized” versions in the field of consciousness studies are now gaining ground, offering viable solutions to the kind of problematic Cartesian dualistic metaphysics that Husserl’s phenomenology suggests.

a. The Embodied Mind

In recent years, the expanding field of cognitive science has explored the role of metaphor in the formation of consciousness (cognition and perception). In a general sense, it appears that contemporary cognitivist, constructivist, and systems (as in self-organizing) approaches to the study of mind incorporate metaphor as a tool for developing an anti-metaphysical, anti-positivist theory of mind, in an attempt to reject any residual Cartesian and Kantian psychologies. The cognitive theories, however, remain partially in debt to Kantian schematism and its role in cognition.

There is furthermore in these theories an overturning of any remaining structuralist suppositions (that language and meaning might be based on autonomous configurations of syntactic elements). Many cognitive scientists, in disagreement with Chomsky’s generative grammar, study meaning as a form of cognition that is activated in context of use. Lakoff and Johnson, in Philosophy in the Flesh, find a great deal of empirical evidence for the ways in which metaphors shape our ordinary experience, exploring the largely unconscious perceptual and linguistic processes that allow us to understand one idea or domain of experience, both conceptual and physical, in terms of a “foreign” domain. The research follows the work of Srini Narayanan and Eleanor Rosch, cognitive scientists who also examine schemas and metaphors as key in embodied theories of cognition. Such theories generally trace the connective interplay between our neuronal makeup, or physical interactions with the environment, and our own private and social human purposes.

In a limited sense, the stress on the embodied nature of cognition aligns itself with the phenomenological position. Perceptual systems, built in physical response to determinate spatio-temporal and linguistic contexts, become phenomenological “spaces” shaped through language use. Yet these researchers largely take issue with Continental phenomenology and traditional philosophy in a dramatic and far-reaching way, objecting to the claim that the phenomenological method of introspection makes adequate space for our ability to survey and describe all available fields of consciousness in the observing subject. If it is the case that we do not fully access the far reaches of hidden cognitive processes, much of the metaphorical mapping which underlies cognition takes place at an unconscious level, which is sometimes referred to as “the cognitive unconscious.”(PIF 12-15)

Other philosophers of mind, including Stefano Arduini, and Antonio D’Amasio, work along similar lines in cognitive linguistics, cognitive science, neuroscience, and artificial intelligence. Their work investigates the ways in which metaphors ground various first and second-order cognitive and emotional operations and functions. Their conclusions share insights with the Continental studies conceiving of metaphor as a “refiguring” of experience. There is then some potential for overlap with this cognitive-conceptual version of metaphor, where metaphors and schemata embody emergent transformative categories enabling the creation of new fields of cognition and meaning.

Arduini, in his work, has explored what he calls the “anthropological ability” to build up representations of the world. Here rhetorical figures are realized on the basis of conceptual domains which create the borders of experience. We have access to a kind of reality that would otherwise be indeterminate, for human beings have the ability to conceptualize the world in imaginative terms through myth, symbol, the unconscious, or any expressive sign. For Arduini, figurative activity does not depict the given world, but allows for the ability to construct world images employed in reality. To be figuratively competent is to use the imagination as a tool which puts patterns together in inventive mental processes. Arduini then seems to recall Nieztsche; anthropologically speaking, humans are always engaging in some form of figuration or form of language, which allows for “cognitive competence” in that it chooses among particular forms which serve to define the surrounding contexts or environments. Again, metaphor is foundational to the apprehension of reality; it is part of the pre-reflective or primordial apparatus of experience, perception, and first- through second-order thought, comprising an entire theoretical approach as well as disciplines such as evolutionary anthropology (see Tooby and Cosmides).

b. The Literary Mind

The work of Gilles Fauconnier and Mark Turner extends that of Lakoff and Johnson outlined above. For Fauconnier, the task of language is to construct, and for the linguist and cognitive scientist it is “a window into the mind.” Independently and together, Fauconnier and Turner’s collaboration results in a theory of conceptual blending in which metaphorical forms take center stage. Basically, the theory of conceptual blending follows from Lakoff and Johnson’s work on the “mapping” or projective qualities of our cognitive faculties. For example, if we return to take Shakespearean line “in me thou seest the glowing of such fire”, the source is fire, whose sets of associations are projected onto the target – in this case the waning aspect of the narrator. Their research shows that large numbers of such cross-domain mappings are expressed as conceptual structures which have propositional content: for example, “life is fire, loss is extinction of fire.” There exist several categories of mappings across different conceptual domains, including spatio-temporal orientation, movement, and containment. For example: “time flies” or “this relationship is smothering.”

Turner’s work in The Literary Mind, takes a slightly different route, portraying these cognitive mechanisms as forms of “storytelling.” This may, superficially, seem counterintuitive to the ordinary observer, but Turner gives ample evidence for the mind’s ability to do much of its everyday work using various forms of narrative projection (LM 6-9). It is not too far a reach from this version of narrative connection back to the hermeneutic and cognitive-conceptual uses of metaphor outlined earlier. If we understand parables to be essentially forms of extended metaphor, we can clearly see the various ways in which they contribute to the making of intelligible experience.

The study of these mental models sheds light on the phenomenological and hermeneutic aspects of reality-construction. If these heuristic models are necessary to cognitive functioning, it is because they allow us to represent higher-order aspects of reality which involve expressions of human agency, intentionality, and motivation. Though we may be largely unaware of these patterns, they are based on our ability to think in metaphor, are necessary, and are continuously working to enable the structuring of intentional experience – which cannot always be adequately represented by straightforward first-order physical description. Fauconnier states:

We see their status as inventions by contrasting them with alternative representations of the world. When we watch someone sitting down in a chair, we see what physics cannot recognize: an animate agent performing an intentional act. (MTL 19-20)

Turner, along with Fauconnier and Lakoff, connects parabolic thought with the image-schematic or mapping between different domains of encounter with our environments. Fauconnier’s work, correlating here with Turner’s, moves between cognitive-scientific and phenomenological considerations; both depict mapping as a constrained form of projection, a complex mental manipulation which moves across mental structures which correspond to various phenomenological spaces of thought, action, and communication.

Metaphorical mapping allows the mind to cross and conflate several domains of experience. The cross-referencing, reminiscent of Black’s interactionist dynamics, amounts to a form of induction resulting from projected relations between a source structure, a pattern we already understand, onto a target structure, that which we seek to understand.

Mapping as a form of metaphoric construction leads to other forms of blending, conceptual integration, and novel category formation. We can, along with Fauconnier and the rest, describe this emergent evolution of linguistic meaning in dialectical terms, arguing that it is possible to mesh together two images of virus (biological and computational) into a third integrated idea that integrates and expands the meaning of the first two (MTL 22). Philosophically speaking, we seem to have come full circle back to the Hegelian theme which runs through the phenomenological analysis of metaphor as a re-mapping of mind and reality.

7. Conclusion

The Continental theories of metaphor that have extrapolated and developed variations on the theme expressed in Nietzsche’s apocryphal pronouncement that truth is “a mobile army of metaphors.” The notion that metaphorical language is somehow ontologically and epistemologically prior to ordinary propositional language has since been voiced by Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida. For these thinkers metaphor serves as a foundational heuristic structure, one which is primarily designed to subvert ordinary reference and in some way dismantle the truth-bearing claims of first-order propositional language. Martin Heidegger’s existential phenomenology does away with the assumption that true or meaningful intentional statements reflect epistemic judgments about the world; that is, they do not derive referential efficacy through the assumed correspondence between an internal idea and an external object. While there may be a kind of agreement between our notions of things and the world in which we find those things, it is still a derivative agreement emerging from a deeper ontologically determined set of relations between things-in-the-world, given or presented to us as inherently linked together in particular historical, linguistic, or cultural contexts.

The role of metaphor in perception and cognition also dominates the work of contemporary cognitive scientists, linguists, and those working in the related fields of evolutionary anthropology and computational theory. While the latter may not be directly associated with Continental phenomenology, aspects of their work support an “anti-metaphysical” position and draw upon common phenomenological themes which stress the embodied, linguistic, contextual, and symbolic nature of knowledge. Thinkers and researchers in this camp argue that metaphoric schemas are integral to human reasoning and action, in that they allow us to develop our cognitive and heuristic capacities beyond simple and direct first order experience.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Categories and De Interpretatione. J.C. Ackrill, trans. Oxford, Clarendon, 1963. (CDI)
  • Aristotle. Peri Hermenenias. Hans Arens, trans. Philadelphia, Benjamins, 1984. (PH)
  • Arduini, Stefano (ed.). Metaphors. Edizioni Di Storia E Letteratura,
  • Barber, A. and Stainton, R. The Concise Encyclopedia of Language and Linguistics.
  • Oxford, Elsevier Ltd., 2010
  • Black, Max. Models and Metaphors. Ithaca, Cornell, 1962. (MAM)
  • Brentano, Franz C. On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle. Berkeley, UC Press, 1975.
  • Cazeaux, Clive. Metaphor and Continental Philosophy, from Kant to Derrida. London, Routledge, 2007.
  • Cooper, David E. Metaphor. London, Oxford, 1986.
  • Derrida, Jacques. “White Mythology, Metaphor in the Text of Philosophy” in Margins of Philosophy, trans. A. Bass, Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 1982. (WM)
  • Fauconnier, Gilles. Mappings in Thought and Language. Cambridge, Cambridge University, 1997. (MTL)
  • Gallagher, Shaun. Phenomenology and Non-reductionist Cognitive Science” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science. ed. by Shaun Gallagher and Daniel Schmicking. Springer, New York, 2010.
  • Goodman, Nelson. Languages of Art. New York, Bobs-Merrill, 1968.
  • Hinman, Lawrence. “Nietzsche, Metaphor, and Truth” in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 43, #2, 1984.
  • Harnad, Stevan. “Category Induction and Representation” in Categorical Perception: The Groundwork of Cognition. New York, Cambridge, 1987.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. John MacQuarrie and E. Robinson, trans. New York,
  • Harper and Row, 1962. (BT)
  • Heidegger, Martin. The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, trans. A. Hofstadter, Bloomington, Indiana University Press, 1982.
  • Huemer, Wolfgang. The Constitution of Consciousness: A Study in Analytic Phenomenology. Routledge, 2005.
  • Johnson, Mark. “Metaphor and Cognition” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science, ed. by Shaun Gallagher and Daniel Schmicking. Springer, New York, 2010.
  • Joy, Morny. “Derrida and Ricoeur: A Case of Mistaken Identity” in The Journal of Religion. Vol. 68, #04, University of Chicago Press, 1988.
  • Kant, Immanuel. The Critique of Pure Reason. Trans. N. K. Smith, New York, 1958. (CPR)
  • Kofman, Sarah, Nietzsche and Metaphor. Trans. D. Large, Stanford, 1993.
  • Lakoff, George and Johnson, Mark. Philosophy in the Flesh: The Embodied Mind and Its Challenge to Western Thought. New York, Perseus-Basic, 1999.
  • Malabou, Catharine. The Future of Hegel: Plasticity, Temporality, and the Dialectic. Trans. Lisabeth During, New York, Routledge, 2005.
  • Nietzsche, F. The Birth of Tragedy and the Case of Wagner. Trans. W. Kaufman. New York, Vintage, 1967. (BOT)
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Imagination and Chance: The Difference Between the Thought of Ricoeur and Derrida. Albany, SUNY Press, 1992
  • Mohanty, J.N. and McKenna, W.R. Husserl’s Phenomenology; A Textbook. Washington, DC, University Press, 1989.
  • Rajan, Tilottama. Deconstruction and the Remainders of Phenomenology: Sartre, Derrida, Foucault, Baudrillard. Stanford, Stanford University Press, 2002.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. Figuring the Sacred, trans. D. Pellauer, Minneapolis, Fortress, 1995. (FS)
  • Ricoeur, Paul. The Rule of Metaphor. Toronto, University of Toronto, 1993. (ROM)
  • Schrift Alan D. and Lawlor, Leonard (eds.) TheHistory of Continental Philosophy; Vol. 4 Phenomenology: Responses and Developments. Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 2010.
  • Stellardi, Giuseppe. Heidegger and Derrida on Philosophy and Metaphor: Imperfect Thought. New York, Humanity-Prometheus, 2000.
  • Tooby, J. and L. Cosmides (ed. with J.Barkow). The Adapted Mind: Evolutionary Psychology and The Generation of Culture. Oxford, 1992.
  • Turner, Mark. The Literary Mind: The Origins of Thought and Language. Oxford, 1996. (LM)
  • Woodruff-Smith, David and McIntyre, Ronald. Husserl and Intentionality: A Study of Mind, Meaning, and Language. Boston, 1982.
  • Zahavi, Dan. “Naturalized Phenomenology” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science.


Author Information

S. Theodorou
Immaculata University
U. S. A.

Mou Zongsan

Mou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) (1909—1995)

Mou ZongsanMou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) is a sophisticated and systematic example of a modern Chinese philosopher. A Chinese nationalist, he aimed to reinvigorate traditional Chinese philosophy through an encounter with Western (and especially German) philosophy and to restore it to a position of prestige in the world. In particular, he engaged closely with Immanuel Kant’s three Critiques and attempted to show, pace Kant, that human beings possess intellectual intuition, a supra-sensible mode of knowledge that Kant reserved to God alone. He assimilated this notion of intellectual intuition to ideas found in Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism and attempted to expand it into a metaphysical system that would establish the objectivity of moral values and the possibility of sagehood.

Mou’s Collected Works run to thirty-three volumes and extend to history of philosophy, logic, epistemology, ontology, metaethics, philosophy of history, and political philosophy.  His corpus is an unusual hybrid in that although its main aim is to erect a metaphysical system, many of the books where Mou pursues that end consist largely of cultural criticism or histories of Confucian, Buddhist, or Daoist philosophy in which Mou explains his own opinions through exegesis of other thinkers’ in a terminology appropriated from Kant, Tiantai Buddhism, and Neo-Confucianism.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Cultural Thought
    1. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation
    2. Development of Chinese Philosophy
    3. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism
  3. Metaphysical Thought
    1. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves
    2. Two-Level Ontology
    3. Perfect Teaching
  4. Criticisms
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Mou was born in 1909, at the very end of China’s imperial era, into the family of a rural innkeeper who admired Chinese classical learning, which the young Mou came to share. At just that time, however, traditional Chinese learning was being denigrated by some of the intellectual elite, who searched frantically for something to replace it due to fears that their own tradition was dangerously impotent against modern nation-states armed with Western science, technology, bureaucracy, and finance.

In 1929, Mou enrolled in Peking (Beijing) University’s department of philosophy. He embarked on a deep study of Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica (then a subject of great interest in Chinese philosophical circles ) and also of Whitehead’s Process and Reality. However, Mou was also led by his interest in Whiteheadian process thought to read voraciously in the pre-modern literature on the Yijing (I Ching or Book of Changes), and his classical tastes made him an oddball at Peking University, which was vigorously modernist and anti-traditional.  Mou would have been a lonely figure there had he not met Xiong Shili in his junior year. Xiong was just making his name as a nationally known apologist for traditional Chinese philosophy and mentored Mou for years afterward.   The two men remained close until Mou later left the mainland. Mou graduated from Peking University in 1933 and moved around the country unhappily from one short-term teaching job to another owing to frequent workplace personality conflicts and fighting between the Chinese government and both Japanese and Communist forces. Despite these peregrinations, Mou wrote copiously on logic and epistemology and also on the Yijing.  Mou hated the Communists very boisterously and when they took over China in 1949 he moved to Taiwan and spent the next decade teaching and writing in a philosophical vein about the history and future of Chinese political thought and culture. In 1960, once again unhappy with his colleagues, Mou was invited by his friend Tang Junyi, also a student of Xiong, to leave Taiwan for academic employment in Hong Kong.  There, Mou’s work took a decisive turn and entered what he later considered its mature stage, yielding the books which established him as a key figure in modern Chinese philosophy. During the next thirty-five years he published seven major monographs (one running to three volumes), together with translations of all three of Immanuel Kant’s Critiques and many more volumes’ worth of articles, lectures, and occasional writings. Mou officially retired from the Chinese University of Hong Kong in 1974 but continued to teach and lecture in Hong Kong and Taiwan until his death in 1995.

We can divide Mou’s expansive thought into two closely related parts which we might call his “cultural” thought, about the history and destiny of Chinese culture, and his “metaphysical” thought, concerning the problems and doctrines of Chinese philosophy, which Mou thought of as the essence of Chinese culture.

2. Cultural Thought

a. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation

Like most intellectuals of his generation, Mou was a nationalist and saw his work as a way to strengthen the Chinese nation and return it to a place of greatness in the world.

Influenced by Hegel, Mou thought of the history and culture of the Chinese nation as an organic whole,, with a natural and knowable course of development. He thought that China’s political destiny depended ultimately on its philosophy, and in turn blamed China’s conquest by the Manchus in 1644, and again by the Communists in 1949, on its loss of focus on the Neo-Confucianism of the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644)He hoped his own work would help to re-kindle China’s commitment to Confucianism and thereby help defeat Communism.

Along with many of his contemporaries, Mou was interested in why China never gave rise its own Scientific Revolution like that in the West, and also in articulating what the strengths were in China’s intellectual history whereby it outstripped the West. Mou phrased his answer to these two questions in terms of “inner sagehood” (neisheng) and “outer kingship” (waiwang). By “inner sagehood,” Mou meant the cultivation of moral conduct and outlook—at which he thought Confucianism was unequalled in the world—and he used “outer kingship” to encompass political governancealong with other ingredients in the welfare of society, such as a productive economy and scientific and technological know-how. Mou thought that China’s classical tradition was historically weak in the theory and practice of “outer kingship,” and he believed that Chinese culture would have to transform itself thoroughly by discovering in its indigenous learning the resources with which to develop traditions of science and democracy.

For the last thirty years of his life, all of Mou’s writings were part of a conversation with Immanuel Kant, whom he considered the greatest Western philosopher and the one most useful for exploring Confucian “moral metaphysics.” Throughout that half of his career, Mou’s books quoted Kant extensively (sometimes for pages at a time) and appropriated Kantian terms into the service of his reconstructed Confucianism. Scholars agree widely that Mou altered the meanings of these terms significantly when he moved them from Kant’s system into his own, but opinions vary about just how conscious Mou was that he had done so.

b. Development of Chinese Philosophy

As an apologist for Chinese philosophy, Mou was anxious to show that its genius extended to almost all areas and epochs of Chinese philosophy. To this end, He wrote extensively about the history of Chinese philosophy and highlighted the important contributions of Daoist and Buddhist philosophy, along with their harmonious interaction with Confucian philosophy in the dialectical unfolding and refinement of Chinese philosophy in each age.

Before China was united under the Qin dynasty (221-206 BCE), Mou believed, Chinese culture gave definitive form to the ancient philosophical inheritance of the late Zhou dynasty (771-221 BCE), culminating in the teachings of Confucius and Mencius. These were still epigrammatic rather systematic, but Mou thought that they already contained the essence of later Chinese philosophy in germinal form. The next great phase of development came in the Wei-Jin period (265-420 CE) with the assimilation of “Neo-Daoism” or xuanxue (literally “dark” or “mysterious learning”), from whence came the first formal articulation of the “perfect teaching” (concerning which see below). Shortly afterward, Mou taught, Chinese culture experienced its first great challenge from abroad, in the form of Buddhist philosophy. In the Sui and Tang dynasties (589-907) it was the task of Chinese philosophy to “digest” or absorb Buddhist philosophy into itself. In the process, it gave birth to indigenous Chinese schools of Buddhist philosophy (most notably Huayan and Tiantai), which Mou believed advanced beyond the Indian schools because they agreed with essential tenets of native Chinese philosophy, such as the teaching that all people are endowed with an innately sagely nature.

On Mou’s account, in the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644) Confucianism underwent a second great phase of development and reasserted itself as the true and proper leader of Chinese culture and philosophy. However, at the end of the Ming, there occurred what Mou taught was an alien irruption into Chinese history by the Manchus, who thwarted the “natural” course of China’s cultural unfolding. In the thinking of late Ming philosophers such as Huang Zongxi (1610-1695), Gu Yanwu (1613-1682), and Wang Fuzhi (1619-1692), Mou thought that China had been poised to give rise to its own new forms of “outer kingship” which would have eventuated in an indigenous birth of science and democracy in China, enabling China to compete with the modern West. Chinese culture, however. was diverted from that healthy course of development by the intrusion of the Manchus. Mou believed that it was this diversion which made China vulnerable to the Communist takeover of the 20th century by alienating it from its own philosophical tradition.

Mou preached that the mission of modern Chinese philosophy was to achieve a mutually beneficial conciliation with Western philosophy. Inspired by the West’s example, China would appropriate science and democracy into its native tradition, and the West in turn would benefit from China’s unparalleled expertise in “inner sagehood,” typified especially by its “perfect teaching.”

However, throughout Mou’s lifetime, he remained unimpressed with the actual state of contemporary Chinese philosophy. He seldom rated any contemporary Chinese thinkers as worthy of the name “philosopher,” and he mentioned Chinese Marxist thought only rarely and only as a force entirely antipathetic to true Chinese philosophy.

c. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism

In his historical writings on Confucianism, Mou is most famous for his thesis of the “three lineages” (san xi). Whereas Neo-Confucians where traditionally grouped into a “School of Principle” represented chiefly by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and a “School of Mind” associated with Lu Xiangshan (1139-1192) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529), Mou also recognized a third lineage exemplified by lesser-known figures as Hu Hong (Hu Wufeng) (1105-1161) and Liu Jishan (Liu Zongzhou) (1578-1645).

Mou judged this third lineage to be the true representatives of Confucian orthodoxy. He criticized Zhu Xi, conventionally regarded as the authoritative synthesizer of Neo-Confucian doctrine, as a usurper who despite good intentions depicted heavenly principle (tianli) in an excessively transcendent way that was foreign to the ancient Confucian message. On Mou’s view, that message is one of paradoxical “immanent transcendence” (neizai chaoyue), in which heavenly principle and human nature are only lexically distinct from each other, not substantially separate. It was because Mou believed that the Hu-Liu lineage of Neo-Confucianism expressed this paradoxical relationship most accurately and artfully that that he ranked it the highest or “perfect” (yuan) expression of Confucian philosophy. (See “Perfect Teaching” below.)

Because Mou wanted to revalorize the whole Chinese philosophical tradition, and not just its Confucian wing, he also wrote extensively on Chinese Buddhist philosophy. He maintained that Indian Buddhist philosophy had remained limited and flawed until in migrated to Chinawhere it was leavened with what Mou saw as core principles of indigenous Chinese philosophy, such as a belief in the basic goodness of both human nature and the world. From Chinese Buddhist thought he adopted methodological ideas that he later applied to his own system. One of these was “doctrinal classification” (panjiao), a doxographic technique of reading competing philosophical systems as forming a dialectical progression of closer and closer approximations to a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao), rather than as mutually incompatible contenders. Much as Mou discovered what he thought of as the highest expression of Confucian doctrine in the largely forgotten thinkers of the Hu-Liu lineage, he found what he thought of as their formal analog and philosophical precursor in the relatively obscure Tiantai school of Buddhism and its thesis of the identity of enlightenment and delusion.

Mou wrote far less about Daoism than Confucianism or Buddhism, but at least in principle he regarded it too as an indispensible part of the Chinese philosophical heritage. Mou focused most on the “Inner Chapters” (neipian) of the Zhuangzi, especially the “Wandering Beyond” (Xiaoyao you) and “Discussion on Smoothing Things Out”(Qi wu lun) and the writings of Wei-Jin commentators Guo Xiang (c. 252-312 CE) and Wang Bi (226-249 CE). Mou saw the Wei-Jin idea of “root and traces” (ji ben) in particular as an early forerunner of Tiantai Buddhist thinking central to its concept of the “perfect teaching.”

3. Metaphysical Thought

In his metaphysical writings, Mou was mainly interested in how moral value is able to exist and how people are able to know it. Mou hoped to show that humans can directly know moral value and indeed that such knowledge amounts to knowledge par excellence. In an inversion of one of Kant’s terms, he called this project “moral metaphysics” (daode de xingshangxue), meaning a metaphysics in which moral value is ontically primary. That is, a moral metaphysics considers that the central ontological fact is that moral value exists and is known or “intuited” by us more directly than anything else. Mou believed that Chinese philosophy alone has generated the necessary insights for constructing such a moral metaphysics, whereas Kant (who represented for Mou the summit of Western philosophy) did not understand moral knowing because, fixated on theoretical and speculative knowledge, he wrong-headedly applied the same transcendentalism that Mou found so masterful in the Critique of Pure Reason (which supposes that we know a thing not directly but only through the distorting lenses of our mental apparatus) to moral matters, where it is completely out of place.

a. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves

For many, the most striking thing about Mou’s philosophy (and the hardest to accept) is his conviction that human beings possess “intellectual intuition” (zhi de zhijue), a direct knowledge of reality without resort to the senses and without overlaying such sensory forms and cognitive categories as time, space, number, and cause and effect.

As with most of the terms that Mou borrowed from Kant, he attached a much different meaning to ‘intellectual intuition.’   For Kant, intellectual intuition was a capacity belonging to God alone. However, Mou thought this was Kant’s greatest mistake and concluded that one of the great contributions of Chinese philosophy to the world was a unanimous belief that humans have intellectual intuition. In the context of Chinese philosophy he took ‘intellectual intuition’ as an umbrella term for the various Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist concepts of a supra-mundane sort of knowing that, when perfected, makes its possessor a sage or a buddha.

On Mou’s analysis, though Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist philosophers call intellectual intuition by different names and theorize it differently, they agree that it is available to everyone, that it transcends subject-object duality, and that it is higher than, and prior to, the dualistic knowledge which comes through the “sensible intuition” of seeing and hearingoften called “empirical” (jingyan) or “grasping” (zhi) knowledge in Mou’s terminology. However, Mou taught that the Confucian understanding of intellectual intuition (referred to by a variety of names such as ren, “benevolence,” or liangzhi, “innate moral knowing”) is superior to the Buddhist and Daoist conceptions because it recognizes that intellectual intuition is essentially moral and creative.

Mou thought that people regularly manifest intellectual intuition in everyday life in the form of morally correct impulses and behaviors. To use the classic Mencian example, if we see a child about to fall down a well, we immediately feel alarm. For Mou, this sudden upsurge of concern is an occurrence of intellectual intuition, spontaneous and uncaused. Furthermore, Mou endorsed what he saw as the Confucian doctrine that it is this essentially moral intellectual intuition that “creates” or “gives birth to the ten thousand things” (chuangsheng wanwu) by conferring on them moral value.

b. Two-Level Ontology

Through our capacity for intellectual intuition, Mou taught, human beings are “finite yet infinite” (youxian er wuxian). He accepted Kant’s system as a good analysis of our finite aspect, which is to say our experience as beings who are limited in space and time and also in understanding, but he also thought that in our exercise of intellectual intuition we transcend our finitude as well.

Accordingly, Mou went to great pains to explain how the world of sensible objects and the realm of noumenal objects, or objects of intellectual intuition, are related to each other in a “two-level ontology” (liangceng cunyoulun) inspired by the Chinese Buddhist text The Awakening of Faith. In this model, all of reality is said to consist of mind, but a mind which has two aspects (yixin ermen). As intellectual intuition, mind directly knows things-in-themselves, without mediation by forms and categories and without the illusion that things-in-themselves are truly separate from mind. This upper level of the two-level ontology is what Mou labels “ontology without grasping” (wuzhi cunyoulun), once again choosing a term of Buddhist inspiration. However, mind also submits itself to forms and categories in a process that Mou calls “self-negation” (ziwo kanxian). Mind at this lower level, which Mou terms the “cognitive mind” (renzhi xin), employs sensory intuition and associated cognitive processes to apprehend things as discrete objects, separate from each other and from mindhaving location in time and space, numerical identity, and causal and other relations. This lower ontological level is what Mou calls “ontology with grasping” (zhi de cunyoulun).

c. Perfect Teaching

On Mou’s view, all of the many types of Chinese philosophy he studied taught some version of this doctrine of intellectual intuition, things-in-themselves, and phenomena, and he considered it important to explain how he adjudicated among these many broadly similar strains of philosophy. To that end, he borrowed from Chinese Buddhist scholasticism the concept of a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao) and the practice of classifying teachings (panjiao) doxographically in order to rank them from less to more “perfect” or complete.

A perfect teaching, in Mou’s sense of the term, is distinguished from a penultimate one not by its content (which is the same in either case) but by its rhetorical form. Specifically, a perfect teaching is couched in the form of a paradox (guijue). In Mou’s opinion, all good examples of Chinese philosophy acknowledge the commonsense difference between subject and object but also teach that we can transcend that difference through the exercise of intellectual intuition. But what distinguishes a perfect teaching is that it makes a show of flatly asserting, in a way supposed to surprise the listener, that subject and object are simply identical to one another, without qualification.

Mou developed this formal concept of a perfect teaching from the example offered by Tiantai Buddhist philosophyHe then applied it to the history of Confucian thoughtidentifying what he thought of as a Confucian equivalent to the Tiantai perfect teaching in the writings of Cheng Hao (1032-1085), Hu Hong, and Liu Jishan. Though Mou believed that all three families of Confucian philosophy—Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist—had their own versions of a perfect teaching, he rated the Confucian perfect teaching more highly than the Buddhist or Daoist ones, for it gives an account of the “morally creative” character of intellectual intuition, which he thought essential. In the Confucian perfect teaching, he taught, intellectual intuition is said to “morally create” the cosmos in the sense that it gives order to chaos by making moral judgments and thereby endowing everything in existence with moral significance.

Mou claimed that the perfect teaching was a unique feature of Chinese philosophy and reckoned this a valuable contribution to world philosophy because, in his opinion, only a perfect teaching supplied an answer to what he called the problem of the “summum bonum” (yuanshan) or “coincidence of virtue and happiness” (defu yizhi), that is, the problem of how it can be assured that a person of virtue will necessarily be rewarded with happiness. He noted that in Kant’s philosophy (and, in his opinion, throughout the rest of Western philosophy too) there could be no such assurance that virtue would be crowned with happiness except to hope that God would make it so in the afterlife. By contrast, Mou was proud to say, Chinese philosophy provides for this “coincidence of virtue and happiness” without having to posit either a God or an afterlife. The argument for that assurance differed in Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist versions of the perfect teaching, but in each case it consisted of a doctrine that intellectual intuition (equivalent to “virtue”) necessarily entails the existence of the phenomenal world (which Mou construed as the meaning of “happiness”), without being contingent on God’s intervention in this world or the next or on any condition other than the operation of intellectual intuition, which Mou considered available to all people at all times.

In arguing for the historical absence of such a solution to the problem of the perfect good anywhere outside of China, Mou did acknowledge that Epicurean and Stoic philosophers also tried to establish that virtue resulted in happiness, but he claimed that their explanations only worked by redefining either virtue or happiness in order to reduce its meaning to something analytically entailed by the other. However, some critics have argued that Mou’s alternative commits the same fault by effectively collapsing happiness into virtue.

4. Criticisms

Mou has often been accused of irrationalism due to his doctrine of the direct, supra-sensory intellectual intuition, which states that people can apprehend the deeper reality underlying the mere phenomena that are measured and described by scientific knowledge. Mou has also been ridiculed because he did not so much present positive arguments in favor of his main metaphysical beliefs as propound them as definitive facts, presumably known to him through a privileged access to sagely intuition.

Critics also frequently question the relevance of Mou’s philosophy, both to the Confucian tradition from which he took his inspiration, as well as to Chinese society. They point out that Mou’s thought (as well as that of other inheritors of Xiong Shili’s legacy in general) inhabits a far different social context than the Confucian tradition with which he identifies. With Mou and his generation, Chinese philosophy was detached from its old homes in the traditional schools of classical learning (shuyuan), the Imperial civil service, and monasteries and hermitages, and was transplanted into the new setting of the modern university, with its disciplinary divisions and limited social role. Critics point to this academicization as evidence that, despite Mou’s aspirations to kindle a massive revival of the Confucian spirit in China, his thought risks being little more than a “lost soul,” deracinated and intellectualized. The first problem with this, they claim, is that Mou reduces Confucianism to a philosophy in the modern academic sense and leaves out other important aspects of the pre-modern Confucian cultural system, such as its art, literature, and ritual and its political and career institutions. Second, they claim, because Mou’s brand of Confucianism accents metaphysics so heavily, it remains confined to departments of philosophy and powerless to exert any real influence over Chinese society.

Mou has also been criticized for his explicit essentialism. In keeping with his Hegelian tendency, he presented China as consisting essentially of Chinese culture, and even more particularly with Chinese philosophy, and he claimed in turn that this is epitomized by Confucian philosophy.  Furthermore, he presents the Confucian tradition as consisting essentially of an idiosyncratic-looking list of Confucian thinkers. Opponents complain that even if there were good reasons for Mou to enshrine his handful of favorite Confucians as the very embodiment of all of Chinese culture, this would remain Mou’s opinion and nothing more, a mere interpretation rather than the objective, factual historical insight that Mou claimed it was.

5. Influence

In Mou’s last decades, he began to be recognized together with other prominent students of Xiong Shili as a leader of what came to be called the “New Confucian” (dangdai xin rujia) movement, which aspires to revive and modernize Confucianism as a living spiritual tradition. Through his many influential protégés, Mou achieved great influence over the agenda of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Two of his early students, Liu Shu-hsien (b. 1934)  and Tu Wei-ming (b. 1940) have been especially active in raising the profile of contemporary Confucianism in English-speaking venues, as has the Canadian-born scholar John Berthrong (b. 1946). Mou’s emphasis on Kant’s transcendental analytic gave new momentum to research on Kant and post-Kantians, particularly in the work of Mou’s student Lee Ming-huei (b. 1953), and his writings on Buddhism lie behind much of the interest in and interpretation of Tiantai philosophy among Chinese scholars. Finally, Mou functions as the main modern influence on, and point of reference for, the intense research on Confucianism among mainland Chinese philosophers today.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Angle, Stephen C. Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Angle, Stephen C. Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy. Cambridge: Polity, 2012.
  • Asakura, Tomomi. “On Buddhistic Ontology: A Comparative Study of Mou Zongsan and Kyoto School Philosophy.” Philosophy East and West 61/4 (October 2011): 647-678.
  • Berthrong, John. “The Problem of Mind: Mou Tsung-san's Critique of Chu Hsi." Journal of Chinese Religion 10 (1982): 367-394.
  • Berthrong, John. All Under Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. “Mou Zongsan's Problem with the Heideggerian Interpretation of Kant.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/2 (June 2006): 225-247.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. Thinking through Confucian Modernity: A Study of Mou Zongsan's Moral Metaphysics. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
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Author Information

Jason Clower
California State University, Chico
U. S. A.

Differential Ontology

Differential Ontology

Differential ontology approaches the nature of identity by explicitly formulating a concept of difference as foundational and constitutive, rather than thinking of difference as merely an observable relation between entities, the identities of which are already established or known. Intuitively, we speak of difference in empirical terms, as though it is a contrast between two things; a way in which a thing, A, is not like another thing, B. To speak of difference in this colloquial way, however, requires that A and B each has its own self-contained nature, articulated (or at least articulable) on its own, apart from any other thing. The essentialist tradition, in contrast to the tradition of differential ontology, attempts to locate the identity of any given thing in some essential properties or self-contained identities, and it occupies, in one form or another, nearly all of the history of philosophy. Differential ontology, however, understands the identity of any given thing as constituted on the basis of the ever-changing nexus of relations in which it is found, and thus, identity is a secondary determination, while difference, or the constitutive relations that make up identities, is primary. Therefore, if philosophy wishes to adhere to its traditional, pre-Aristotelian project of arriving at the most basic, fundamental understanding of things, perhaps its target will need to be concepts not rooted in identity, but in difference.

“Differential ontology” is a term that may be applied particularly to the works and ideas of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze. Their successors have extended their work into cinema studies, ethics, theology, technology, politics, the arts, and animal ethics, among others.

This article consists of three main sections. The first explores a brief history of the problem. The historical emergence of the problem in ancient Greek philosophy reveals not only the dangers of a philosophy of difference, but also demonstrates that it is a philosophical problem that is central to the nature of philosophy as such, and is as old as philosophy itself. The second section explores some of the common themes and concerns of differential ontology. The third section discusses differential ontology through the specific lenses of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze.

Table of Contents

  1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy
    1. Heraclitus
    2. Parmenides
    3. Plato
    4. Aristotle
  2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology
    1. Immanence
    2. Time as Differential
    3. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics
  3. Key Differential Ontologists
    1. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist
    2. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Other Sources Cited in this Article

1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy

Although the concept of differential ontology is applied specifically to Derrida and Deleuze, the problem of difference is as old as philosophy itself. Its precursors lie in the philosophies of Heraclitus and Parmenides, it is made explicit in Plato and deliberately shut down in Aristotle, remaining so for some two and a half millennia before being raised again, and turned into an explicit object of thought, by Derrida and Deleuze in the middle of the twentieth century.

a. Heraclitus

From its earliest beginnings, what distinguishes ancient Greek philosophy from a mythologically oriented worldview is philosophy’s attempt to offer a rationally unified picture of the operations of the universe, rather than a cosmos subject to the fleeting and conflicting whims of various deities, differing from humans only in virtue of their power and immortality. The early Milesian philosophers, for instance, had each sought to locate among the various primitive elements a first principle (or archê). Thales had argued that water was the primary principle of all things, while Anaximenes had argued for air. Through various processes and permutations (or in the case of Anaximenes, rarefaction and condensation), this first principle assumes the forms of the various other elements with which we are familiar, and of which the cosmos is comprised. All things come from this primary principle, and eventually, they return to it.

Against such thinkers, Heraclitus of Ephesus (fl. c.500 BCE) argues that fire is the first principle of the cosmos: “The cosmos, the same for all, no god or man made, but it always was, is, and will be, an everlasting fire, being kindled in measures and put out in measures.” (DK22B30) From this passage, we are able to glean a few things. The most obvious divergence is that Heraclitus names fire as the basic element, rather than water, air, or, in the case of Anaximander, the boundless (apeiron). But secondly, unlike the Milesians, Heraclitus does not hold in favor of any would-be origin of the cosmos. The universe always was and always will be this self-manifesting, self-quenching, primordial fire, expressed in nature’s limitless ways. So while fire, for Heraclitus, may be ontologically basic in some sense, it is not temporally basic or primordial: it did not, in the temporal or sequential order of things, come first.

However, like his Milesian predecessors, Heraclitus appears to provide at least a basic account for how fire as first principle transforms: “The turnings of fire: first sea, and of sea, half is earth, half lightning flash.” (DK22B31a) Elsewhere we can see more clearly that fire has ontological priority only in a very limited sense for Heraclitus: “The death of earth is to become water, and the death of water is to become air, and the death of air is to become fire, and reversely.” (DK22B76) Earth becomes water; water becomes air; air becomes fire, and reversely. Combined with the two passages above, we can see that the ontological priority of fire is its transformative power. Fire from the sky consumes water, which later falls from the sky nourishing the earth. Likewise, fire underlies water (which in its greatest accumulations rages and howls as violently as flame itself), out of which comes earth and the meteorological or ethereal activity itself. Thus we can see the greatest point of divergence between Heraclitus and his Milesian forbears: the first principle of Heraclitus is not a substance. Fire, though one of the classical elements, is of its very nature a dynamic element—a vital element that is nothing more than its own transformation. It creates (volcanoes produce land masses; furnaces temper steel; heat cooks our food and keeps us safe from elemental exposure), but it also destroys in countless obvious ways; it hardens and strengthens, just as it weakens and consumes. Fire, then, is not an element in the sense of a thing, but more as a process. In contemporary scientific terms, we would say that it is the result of a chemical reaction, its essence for Heraclitus lies in its obvious dynamism. When we look at things (like tables, trees, homes, people, and so forth), they seem to exemplify a permanence which is saliently missing from our experience of fire.

This brings us to the next point: things, for Heraclitus, only appear to have permanence; or rather, their permanence is a result of the processes that make up the identities of the things in question. Here it is appropriate to cite the famous river example, found in more than one Heraclitean fragment: “You cannot step twice into the same rivers; for fresh waters are flowing in upon you.” (DK22B12) “We step and do not step into the same rivers; we are and are not.” (DK22B49a) These passages highlight the seemingly paradoxical nature of the cosmos. On the one hand, of course there is a meaningful sense in which one may step twice into the same river; one may wade in, wade back out, then walk back in again; this body of water is marked between the same banks, the same land markers, and the same flow of water, and so forth. But therein lies the paradox: the water that one waded into the first time is now completely gone, having been replaced by an entirely new configuration of particles of water. So there is also a meaningful sense in which one cannot step into the same river twice. But it is this particular flowing that makes this river this river, and nothing else. Its identity, therefore (as also my own identity), is an effervescent impermanence, constituted on the basis of the flows that make it up. We peer into nature and see things—rivers, people, animals, and so forth—but these are only temporary constitutions, even deceptions: “Men are deceived in their knowledge of things that are manifest.” (DK22B56) The true nature of nature itself, however, continuously eludes us: “Nature tends to conceal itself.” (DK22B123)

The paradoxical nature of things, (that their identities are constituted on the basis of processes), helps us to make sense of Heraclitus’ proclamation of the unity of opposites, (which both Plato and Aristotle held to be unacceptable). Fire is vital and powerful, raging beneath the appearances of nature like a primordial ontological state of warfare: “War is the father of all and the king of all.” (DK22B53) The very same process-driven nature of things that makes a thing what it is by the same operations tends toward the thing’s undoing as well. As we saw, fire is responsible for the opposite and complementary functions of both creativity and destruction. The nature of things is to tend toward their own undoing and eventual passage into their opposites: “What opposes unites, and the finest attunement stems from things bearing in opposite directions, and all things come about by strife.” (DK22B8).

It is in this sense that all things are, for Heraclitus, one. The creative-destructive operations of nature underlie all of its various expressions, binding the whole of the cosmos together in accordance with a rational principle of organization, recognized only in the universal and timeless truth that everything is constantly subject to the law of flux and impermanence: “It is wise to hearken, not to me, but to the Word [logos—otherwise translatable as reason, argument, rational principle, and so forth], and to confess that all things are one.” (DK22B50). Thus it is that Heraclitus is known as the great thinker of becoming or flux. The being of the cosmos, the most essential fact of its nature, lies in its becoming; its only permanence is its impermanence. For our purposes, we can say that Heraclitus was the first philosopher of difference. Where his predecessors had sought to identify the one primordial, self-identical substance or element, out of which all others had emerged, Heraclitus had attempted to think the world, nothing more than the world, in a permanent state (if this is not too paradoxical) of flux.

b. Parmenides

Parmenides (b. 510 BCE) was likely a young man at the time when Heraclitus was philosophically active. Born in Elea, in Lower Italy, Parmenides’ name is the one most commonly associated with Eleatic monism. While (ironically) there is no one standard interpretation of Eleatic monism, probably the most common understanding of Parmenides is filtered through our familiarity with the paradoxes of his successor, Zeno, who argued, in defense of Parmenides, that what we humans perceive as motion and change are mere illusions.

Against this backdrop, what we know of Parmenides’ views come to us from his didactic poem, titled On Nature, which now exists in only fragmentary form. Here, however, we find Parmenides, almost explicitly objecting to Heraclitus: “It is necessary to say and to think that being is; for it is to be/but it is by no means nothing. These things I bid you ponder./For from this first path of inquiry, I bar you./then yet again from that along which mortals who know nothing/wander two-headed: for haplessness in their/breasts directs wandering understanding. They are borne along/deaf and blind at once, bedazzled, undiscriminating hordes,/who have supposed that being and not-being are the same/and not the same; but the path of all is back-turning.” (DK28B6) There are a couple of important things to note here. First, the mention of those who suppose that being and not-being are the same and not the same hearkens almost explicitly to Heraclitus’ notion of the unity of opposites. Secondly, Parmenides declares this to be the opinion of the undiscriminating hordes, the masses of non-philosophically-minded mortals.

Therefore, Heraclitus, on Parmenides’ view, does not provide a philosophical account of being; rather, he simply coats in philosophical language the everyday experience of the mob. Against Heraclitus’ critical diagnosis that humans (deceptively) see only permanent things, Parmenides claims that permanence is precisely what most people, Heraclitus included, miss, preoccupied as we are with the mundane comings and goings of the latest trends, fashions, and political currents. The being of the cosmos lies not in its becoming, as Heraclitus thought. Becoming is nothing more than an illusion, the perceptions of mortal minds. What is, for Parmenides, is and cannot not be, while what is not, is not, and cannot be. Neither is it possible to even think of what is not, for to think of anything entails that it must be an object of thought. Thus to meditate on something that is not an object is, for Parmenides, contradictory. Therefore, “for the same thing is for thinking and for being.” (DK28B3)

Being is indivisible; for in order to divide being from itself, one would have to separate being from being by way of something else, either being or not-being. But not-being is not and cannot be, (so not-being cannot separate being from being). And if being is separated from being by way of being, then being itself in this thought-experiment is continuous, that is to say, being is undivided (and indivisible): “for you will not sever being from holding to being.” (DK28B4.2) Being is eternal and unchanging; for if being were to change or become in any way, this would entail that in some sense it had participated or would participate in not-being which is impossible: “How could being perish? How could it come to be?/For if it came to be, it was not, nor if it is ever about to come to be./In this way becoming has been extinguished and destruction is not heard of.” (DK28B8.19-21)

Being, for Parmenides, is thus eternal, unchanging, and indivisible spatially or temporally. Heraclitus might have been right to note the way things appear, (as a constant state of becoming) but he was wrong, on Parmenides’ view, to confuse the way things appear with the way things actually are, or with the “steadfast heart of persuasive truth.” (DK28B1.29) Likewise, Parmenides has argued, thought can only genuinely attend to being—what is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible. Whatever it is that Heraclitus has found in the world of impermanence, it is not, Parmenides holds, philosophy. While unenlightened mortals may attend to the transience of everyday life, the path of genuine wisdom lies in the eternal and unchanging. Thus, while Heraclitus had been the first philosopher of difference, Parmenides is the first to assert explicitly that self-identity, and not difference, is the basis of philosophical thought.

c. Plato

It is these two accounts, the Heraclitean and the Parmenidean (with an emphatic privileging of the latter), that Plato attempts to answer and fuse in his theory of forms. Throughout Plato’s Dialogues, he consistently gives credence to the Heraclitean observation that things in the material world are in a constant state of flux. The Parmenidean inspiration in Plato’s philosophy, however, lies in the fact that, like Parmenides, Plato will explicitly assert that genuine knowledge must concern itself only with that which is eternal and unchanging. So, given the transient nature of material things, Plato will hold that knowledge, strictly speaking, does not apply to material things specifically, but rather, to the Forms (eternal and unchanging) of which those material things are instantiations. In Book V of the Republic, Plato (through Socrates) argues that each human capacity has a matter that is proper exclusively to it. For example, the capacity of seeing has as its proper matter waves of light, while the capacity of hearing has as its proper matter waves of sound. In a proclamation that hearkens almost explicitly to Parmenides, knowledge, Socrates argues, concerns itself with being, while ignorance is most properly affiliated with not-being.

From here, the account continues, (with an eye toward Heraclitus). Everything that exists in the world participates both in being and in not-being. For example, every circle both is and is not “circle.” It is a circle to the extent that we recognize its resemblance, but it is not circle (or the absolute embodiment of what it means to be a circle) because we also recognize that no circle as manifested in the world is a perfect circle. Even the most circular circle in the world will possess minor imperfections, however slight, that will make it not a perfect circle. Thus the things in the world participate both in being and in not-being. (This is the nature of becoming). Since being and not-being each has a specific capacity proper to it, becoming, lying between these two, must have a capacity that is proper only to it. This capacity, he argues, is opinion, which, as is fitting, is that epistemological mode or comportment lying somewhere between knowledge and ignorance.

Therefore, when one’s attention is turned only to the things of the world, she can possess only opinions regarding them. Knowledge, reserved only for that domain of being, that which is and cannot not be, for Plato, applies only to the Form of the thing, or what it means to be x and nothing but x. This Form is an eternal and unchanging reality. If one has knowledge of the Form, then one can evaluate each particular in the world, in order to accurately determine whether or not it in fact accords with the principle in question. If not, one may only have opinions about the thing. For example, if one possesses knowledge of the Form of the beautiful, then one may evaluate particular things in the world—paintings, sculptures, bodies, and so forth—and know whether or not they are in fact beautiful. Lacking this knowledge, however, one may hold opinions as to whether or not a given thing is beautiful, but one will never have genuine knowledge of it. More likely, she will merely possess certain tastes on the matter—(I like this poem; I do not like that painting, and so forth.) This is why Socrates, especially in the earlier dialogues, is adamant that his interlocutors not give him examples in order to define or explain their concepts (a pious action is doing what I am doing now...). Examples, he argues, can never tell me what the Form of the thing is, (such as piety, in the Euthyphro). The philosopher, Plato holds, concerns himself with being, or the essentiality of the Form, as opposed to the lover of opinion, who concerns himself only with the fleeting and impermanent.

From this point, however, things in the Platonic account start to get more complicated. “Participation” is itself a somewhat messy notion that Plato never quite explains in any satisfactory way. After all, what does it mean to say, as Socrates argues in the Republic, that the ring finger participates in the form of the large when compared to the pinky, and in the form of the small when compared to the middle finger? It would seem to imply that a thing’s participation in its relevant Form derives, not from anything specific about its nature, but only insofar as its nature is related to the nature of another thing. But the story gets even more complicated in that at multiple points in his later dialogues, Plato argues explicitly for a Form of the different, which complicates what we typically call Platonism, almost beyond the point of recognition, (see, for example, Theaetetus 186a; Parmenides 143b, 146b, and 153a; and Sophist 254e, 257b, and 259a).

On its face, this should not be surprising. If a finger sometimes participates in the form of the large and sometimes in the form of the small, it should stand to reason that any given thing, when looked at side by side with something similar, will be said to participate in the form of the same, while by extension, when compared to something that differs in nature, will be said to participate in the form of the different—and participate more greatly in the form of the different, the more different the two things are. A baseball, side by side with a softball, will participate greatly in the form of the same, (but somewhat in the Form of the different), but when looked at side by side with a cardboard box, will participate more in the Form of the different.

But consistently articulating what a Form of the different would be is more complicated than it may at first seem. To say that the Form of x is what it means to be x and nothing but x is comprehensible enough, when one is dealing with an isolable characteristic or set of characteristics of a thing. If we say, for instance, that the Form of circle is what it means to be a circle and nothing but a circle, we know that we mean all of the essential characteristics that make a circle, a circle, (a round-plane figure the boundary of which consists of points, equidistant from a center; an arc of 360°, and so forth.). By implication, each individual Form, to the extent that it completely is what it is, also participates equally in the Form of the same, in that it is the same as itself, or it is self-identical. But what can it possibly mean to say that the form of the different is what it means to be different and nothing but different? It would seem to imply that the identity of the form of the different is that it differs, but this requires that it differs even from itself. For if the essence of the different is that it is the same as the different, (in the way that the essence of circle is self-identical to what it means to be circle), then this would entail that the essence of the Form of the different is that, to the same extent that it is different, it participates equally in the Form of the same, (or that, like the rest of the Forms, it is self-identical). But the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same; it must bear nothing of the Form of the same. But this means that the Form of the different must be different from the different as well; put otherwise, while for every other conceivable Platonic Form, one can say that it is self-identical, the Form of the different would be absolutely unique in that its nature would be defined by its self-differentiation.

But there are further complications still. Each Form in Plato’s ontology must relate to every other Form by way of the Form of the different. From this it follows that, just as the Form of the same pervades all the other Forms, (in that each is identical to itself), the Form of the different also pervades all the other Forms, (in that each Form is different from every other). This implies, in some sense, that the different is co-constitutive, along with Plato’s Form of the same, of each other individual Form. After all, part of what makes a thing what it is, (and hence, self-same, or self-identical), is that it differs from everything that it is not. To the extent that the Form of the same makes any given Form what it is, it is commensurably different from every other Form that it is not.

This complication, however, reaches its apogee when we consider the Form of the same specifically. As we said, the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same. The Form of the same differs from all other Forms as well. While, for instance, the Form of the beautiful participates in the Form of the same, (in that the beautiful is the same as the beautiful, or it is self-identical), nevertheless, the Form of the same is different from, (that is, it is not the same as) the Form of the beautiful. The Form of the same differs, similarly, from all other Forms. However, its difference from the Form of the different is a special relation. If the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same, we can say reciprocally, that the Form of the same is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the different; it relates to the different through the different. But this means that, to the extent that the Form of the same is self-same, or self-identical, it is so because it differs absolutely from the Form of the different. This entails, however, that its self-sameness derives from its maximal participation in the Form of the different itself.

We see, then, the danger posed by Plato’s Form of the different, and hence, by any attempt to formulate a concept of difference itself. Plato’s Form of the same is ubiquitous throughout his ontology; it is, in a certain sense, the glue that holds together the rest of the Forms, even if in many of his Middle Period dialogues, it never makes an explicit appearance. Simply by understanding what a Form means for Plato, we can see the central role that the Form of the same plays for this, or for that matter, any other essentialist ontology. By simply introducing a Form of the different, and attempting to rigorously think through its implications, one can see that it threatens to fundamentally undermine the Form of the same itself, and hence by implication, difference threatens to devour the whole rest of the ontological edifice of essentialism. Plato, it seems, was playing with Heraclitean fire. It is likely largely for this reason that Aristotle, Plato’s greatest student, nixes the Form of the different in his Metaphysics.

d. Aristotle

In the Metaphysics, Aristotle attempts to correct what he perceives to be many of Plato’s missteps. For our purposes, what is most important is his treatment of the notion of difference. For Aristotle inserts into the discussion a presupposition that Plato had not employed, namely, that ‘difference’ may be said only of things which are, in some higher sense, identical. Where Plato’s Form of the different may be said to relate everything to everything else, Aristotle argues that there is a conceptual distinction to be made between difference and otherness.

For Aristotle, there are various ways in which a thing may be said to be one, in terms of: (1) Continuity; (2) Wholeness or unity; (3) Number; (4) Kind. The first two are a bit tricky to distinguish, even for Aristotle. By continuity, he means the general sense in which a thing may be said to be a thing. A bundle of sticks, bound together with twine, may be said to be one, even if it is a result of human effort that has made it so. Likewise, an individual body part, such as an arm or leg, may be said to be one, as it has an isolable functional continuity. Within this grouping, there are greater and lesser degrees to which something may be said to be one. For instance, while a human leg may be said to be one, the tibia or the femur, on their own, are more continuous, (in that each is numerically one, and the two of them together form the leg).

With respect to wholeness or unity, Aristotle clarifies the meaning of this as not differing in terms of substratum. Each of the parts of a man, (the legs, the arms, the torso, the head), may be said to be, in their own way, continuous, but taken together, and in harmonious functioning, they constitute the oneness or the wholeness of the individual man and his biological and psychological life. In this sense, the man is one, in that all of his parts function naturally together towards common ends. In the same respect, a shoelace, each eyelet, the sole, and the material comprising the shoe itself, may be said to be, each in their own way, continuous, while taken together, they constitute the wholeness of the shoe.

Oneness in number is fairly straightforward. A man is one in the organic sense above, but he is also one numerically, in that his living body constitutes one man, as opposed to many men. Finally, there is generic oneness, the oneness in kind or in intelligibility. There is a sense in which all human beings, taken together, may be said to be one, in that they are all particular tokens of the genus human. Likewise, humans, cats, dogs, lions, horses, pigs, and so forth, may all be said to be one, in that they are all types of the genus animal.

Otherness is the term that Aristotle uses to characterize existent things which are, in any sense of the term, not one. There is, as we said, a sense in which a horse and a woman are one, (in that both are types of the genus animal), but an obvious sense in which they are other as well. There is a sense in which my neighbor and I are one, (in that we are both tokens of the genus human), but insofar as we are materially, emotionally, and psychologically distinct, there is a sense in which I am other than my neighbor as well. There is an obvious sense in which I and my leg are one but there is also a sense in which my leg is other than me as well, (for if I were to lose my leg in an accident, provided I received prompt and proper medical attention, I would continue to exist). Every existent thing, Aristotle argues, is by its very nature either one with or other than every other existent thing.

But this otherness does not, (as it does for Plato’s Form of the different), satisfy the conditions for what Aristotle understands as difference. Since everything that exists is either one with or other than everything else that exists, there need not be any definite sense in which two things are other. Indeed, there may be, (as we saw above, my neighbor and I are one in the sense of tokens of the genus human, but are other numerically), but there need not be. For instance, you are so drastically other than a given place, say, a cornfield, that we need not even enumerate the various ways in which the two of you are other.

This, however, is the key for Aristotle: otherness is not the same as difference. While you are other than a particular cornfield, you are not different than a cornfield. Difference, strictly speaking, applies only when there is some definite sense in which two things may be said to differ, which requires a higher category of identity within which a distinction may be drawn: “For the other and that which it is other than need not be other in some definite respect (for everything that is existent is either other or same), but that which is different is different from some particular thing in some particular respect, so that there must be something identical whereby they differ. And this identical thing is genus or species...” (Metaphysics, X.3) In other words, two human beings may be different, (that is, one may be taller, lighter-skinned, a different gender, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specific members of the genus ‘human.’ A human being may be different than a cat, (that is, one is quadripedal while the other is bipedal, one is non-rational while the other is rational, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specified members of the genus ‘animal.’

But between these two, generic and specific, specific difference or contrariety is, according to Aristotle, the greatest, most perfect, or most complete. This assessment too is rooted in Aristotle’s emphasis on identity as the basis of differentiation. Differing in genus in Aristotelian terminology means primarily belonging to different categories of being, (substance, time, quality, quantity, place, relation, and so forth.) You are other than ‘5,’ to be sure, but Aristotle would not say that you are different from ‘5,’ because you are a substance and ‘5’ is a quantity and given that these two are distinct categories of being, for Aristotle there is not really a meaningful sense in which they can be said to relate, and hence, there is not a meaningful sense in which they can be said to differ. Things that differ in genus are so far distant (closer, really, to otherness), as to be nearly incomparable. However, a man may be said to be different than a cat, because the characteristics whereby they are distinguished from each other are contrarieties, occupying opposing sides of a given either/or, for instance, rational v. non-rational. Special difference or contrariety thus provides us with an affirmation or a privation, a ‘yes’ or a ‘no’ that constitutes the greatest difference, according to Aristotle. Differences in genus are too great, while differences within species are too minute and numerous (skin color, for instance, is manifested in an infinite myriad of ways), but special contrariety is complete, embodying an affirmation or negation of a particular given quality whereby genera are differentiated into species.

There are thus two senses in which, for Aristotle, difference is thought only in accordance with a principle of identity. First, there is the identity that two different things share within a common genus. (A rock and a tree are identical in that both are members of the genus, ‘substance,’ differentiated by the contrariety of ‘living/non-living.’) Second, there is the identity of the characteristic whereby two things are differentiated: material (v. non-material), living (v. non-living), sentient (v. non-sentient), rational (v. irrational), and so forth.

We see, then, that with Aristotle, difference becomes fully codified within the tradition as the type of empirical difference that we mentioned at the outset of this article: it is understood as a recognizable relation between two things which, prior to (and independently of) their relating, possess their own self-contained identities. This difference then is a way in which a thing A, (which is identical to itself) is not like a thing B (which is identical to itself), while both belong to a higher category of identity, (in the sense of an Aristotelian genus). Given the difficulties that we encountered with Plato’s attempt to think a Form of the different, it is perhaps little wonder that Aristotle’s understanding of difference was left unchallenged for nearly two and a half millennia.

2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology

As noted in the Introduction, differential ontology is a term that can be applied to two specific thinkers (Deleuze and Derrida) of the late twentieth century, along with those philosophers who have followed in the wakes of these two. It is, nonetheless, not applicable as a school of thought, in that there is not an identifiable doctrine or set of doctrines that define what they think. Indeed, for as many similarities that one can find between them, there are likely equally many distinctions as well. They work out of different philosophical traditions: Derrida primarily from the Hegel-Husserl-Heidegger triumvirate, with Deleuze, (speaking critically of the phenomenological tradition for the most part) focusing on the trinity of Spinoza-Nietzsche-Bergson. Theologically, they are interested in different sources, with Derrida giving constant nods to thinkers in the tradition of negative theology, such as Meister Eckhart, while Deleuze is interested in the tradition of univocity, specifically in John Duns Scotus. They have different attitudes toward the history of metaphysics, with Derrida working out of the Heideggerian platform of the supposed end of metaphysics, while Deleuze explicitly rejects all talk of any supposed end of metaphysics. They hold different attitudes toward their own philosophical projects, with Derrida coining the term, (following Heidegger’s Destruktion), deconstruction, while for Deleuze, philosophy is always a constructivism. In many ways, it is difficult to find two thinkers who are less alike than Deleuze and Derrida. Nevertheless, what makes them both differential ontologists is that they are working within a framework of specific thematic critiques and assumptions, and that on the basis of these factors, both come to argue that difference in itself has never been recognized as a legitimate object of philosophical thought, to hold that identities are always constituted, on the basis of difference in itself, and to explicitly attempt to formulate such a concept. Let us now look to these thematic, structural elements.

a. Immanence

The word immanence is contrasted with the word transcendence. “Transcendence” means going beyond, while “immanence” means remaining within, and these designations refer to the realm of experience. In most monotheistic religious traditions, for instance, which emphasize creation ex nihilo, God is said to be transcendent in the sense that He exists apart from His creation. God is the source of nature, but God is not, Himself, natural, nor is he found within anything in nature except perhaps in the way in which one might see reflections of an artist in her work of art. Likewise God does not, strictly speaking, resemble any created thing. God is eternal, while created beings are temporal; God is without beginning, while created things have a beginning; God is a necessary being, while created things are contingent beings; God is pure spirit, while created things are material. The creature closest in nature to God is the human being who, according to the Biblical book of Genesis, is created in the image of God, but even in this case, God is not to be understood as resembling human beings: “For my thoughts are not your thoughts, neither are my ways your ways...” (Isaiah 55:8).

In this sense, we can say that historically, the trend in Eastern philosophies and religions (which are not as radically differentiated as they are in the Western tradition), has always leaned much more in the direction of immanence than of transcendence, and definitely more so than nearly all strains of Western monotheism. In schools of Eastern philosophy that have some notion of the divine (and a great many of them do not), many if not most understand the divine as somehow embodied or manifested within the world of nature. Such a position would be considered idolatrous in most strains of Western monotheism.

With respect to the Western philosophical tradition specifically, we can say that, even in moments when religious tendencies and doctrines do not loom large, (like they do, for instance, during the Medieval period), there nevertheless remains a dominant model of transcendence throughout, though this transcendence is emphasized in greater and lesser degrees across the history of philosophy. There have been outliers, to be sure—Heraclitus comes to mind, along with Spinoza and perhaps David Hume, but they are rare. A philosophy rooted in transcendence will, in some way, attempt to ground or evaluate life and the world on the basis of principles or criteria not found (indeed not discoverable de jure) among the living or in the world. When Parmenides asserts that the object of philosophical thought must be that which is, and which cannot not be, which is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible, he is describing something beyond the realm of experience. When Plato claims that genuine knowledge is found only in the Form; when he argues in the Phaedo that the philosophical life is a preparation for death; that one must live one’s life turning away from the desires of the body, in the purification of the spirit; when he alludes, (through the mouth of Socrates) to life as a disease, he is basing the value of this world on a principle not found in the world. When St. Paul writes that “...the flesh lusts against the Spirit, and the Spirit against the flesh; and these are contrary to one another, so that you do not do the things you wish” (Galatians 5:17), and that “the mind governed by the flesh is death,” (Romans 8:6), he is evaluating this world against another. When René Descartes recognizes his activity of thinking and finds therein a soul; when John Locke bases Ideas upon a foundation of primary qualities, immanent, allegedly, to the thing, but transcendent to our experience; when Immanuel Kant bases phenomenal appearances upon noumenal realities, which, outside of space, time, and all causality, ever elude cognition; when an ethical thinker seeks a moral law, or an absolute principle of the good against which human behaviors may be evaluated; in each of these cases, a transcendence of some sort is posited—something not found within the world is sought in order to make sense of or provide a justification for this world.

Famously, Friedrich Nietzsche argued that the history of philosophy was one of the true world finally becoming a fable. Tracing the notion of the true world from its sagely Platonic (more accurately, Parmenidean) inception up through and beyond its Kantian (noumenal) manifestation, he demonstrates that as the demand for certainty (the will to Truth) intensifies, the so-called true world becomes less plausible, slipping further and further away, culminating in the moment he called “the death of God.” The true world has now been abolished, leaving only the apparent world. But the world was only ever called apparent by comparison with a purported true world (think here of Parmenides’ castigation of Heraclitus). Thus, when the true world is abolished, the apparent world is abolished as well; and we are left with only the world, nothing more than the world.

One of the key features of differential ontology will be the adoption of Nietzsche’s proclaimed (and reclaimed) enthusiasm for immanence. Deleuze and Derrida will, each in his own way, argue that philosophy must find its basis within and take as its point of departure the notion of immanence. As we shall see below, in Deleuze’s philosophy, this emphasis on immanence will take the form of his enthusiasm for the Scotist doctrine of the univocity of being. For Derrida, it will be his lifelong commitment to the phenomenological tradition, inspired by the vast body of research conducted over nearly half a century by Edmund Husserl, out of which Derrida’s professional research platform began, (and in which he discovers the notion of différance).

b. Time as Differential

Related to the privileging of immanence is the second principle of central importance to differential ontology, a careful and rigorous analysis of time. Such analysis, inspired by Edmund Husserl, will yield the discovery of a differential structure, which stands in opposition to the traditional understanding of time, the spatially organized, puncti-linear model of time. This refers to a conglomeration of various elements from Plato, Aristotle, St. Augustine, Boethius, and ultimately, the Modern period.

Few thinkers have attempted so rigorously as Aristotle to think the paradoxical nature of time. If we take the very basic model of time as past-present-future, Aristotle notes that one part of this (the past), has been but is no more, while another part of it (the future) will be but is not yet. There is an inherent difficulty, therefore, in trying to understand what time is, because it seems as though it is composed of parts made up of things that do not exist; therefore, we are attempting to understand what something that does not exist, is.

Furthermore, the present or the now itself, for Aristotle, is not a part of time, because a part is so called because of its being a constitutive element of a whole. However, time, Aristotle claims, is not made up of nows, in the same way that a line, though it has points, is not made up of points.

Likewise, the now cannot simply remain the same, but nor can it be said to be discrete from other nows and ever-renewed. For if the now is ever the same, then everything that has ever happened is contained within the present now, (which seems absurd); but if each now is discrete, and is constantly displaced by another discrete, self-contained now, the displacement of the old now would have to take place within (or simultaneously with) the new, incoming now, which would be impossible, as discrete nows cannot be simultaneous; hence time as such would never pass.

Aristotle will therefore claim that there is a sense in which the now is constantly the same, and another sense in which it is constantly changing. The now is, Aristotle argues, both a link of and the limit between future and past. It connects future and past, but is at the same time the end of the past and the beginning of the future; but the future and the past lie on opposite sides of the now, so the now cannot, strictly speaking, belong either to the past or to the future. Rather, it divides the past from the future. The essence of the now is this division—as such, the now itself is indivisible, “the indivisible present ‘now’.” (Physics IV.13). Insofar as each now succeeds another in a linear movement from future to past, the now is ever-changing—what is predicated of the now is constantly filled out in an ever-new way. But structurally speaking, inasmuch as the now is always that which divides and unites future and past, it is constantly the same.

Without the now, there would be no time, Aristotle argues, and vice versa. For what we call time is merely the enumeration that takes place in the progression of history between some moment, future or past, relative to the now moment: “For time is just this—number of motion in respect of ‘before’ and ‘after’.” (Physics, IV.11)

Here, then, are the elements that Aristotle leaves us with: an indivisible now moment that serves as the basis of the measure of time, which is a progression of enumeration taking place between moments, and a notion of relative distance that marks that progression of enumeration.

In Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius, we find an important distinction between time and eternity: (it is important to note that Aristotle’s discussion of time is found in his Physics, not in his Metaphysics, because time, as the measure of change, belongs only to the things of nature, not to the divine). The reason that this is an important distinction for our purposes is that eternity, (for Plato, Augustine, and Boethius), is the perspective of the divine, while temporality is the perspective of creation. Eternity, for all three of these thinkers, does not mean passing through every moment of time in the sense of having always been there, and always being there throughout every moment of the future, (which is called ‘sempiternity’). All three of these philosophers view time as itself a created thing, and eternity, the perspective of the divine, stands outside of time.

Having created the entire spectrum of time, and standing omnisciently outside of time, the divine sees the whole of time, in an ever-present now. This complete fullness of the now is how Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius understand eternity. Once we have made this move, however, it is a very short leap to the conclusion that, in a sense, all of time is ever-present; certainly not from our perspective, but from the perspective of the divine. In other words, right now, in an ever-present now, God is seeing the exodus of the Israelites, the sacking of Troy, the execution of Socrates, the crucifixion of Jesus, the fall of the Roman Empire, and the moment (billions of years from now) that the sun will become a Red Giant. Therefore, what we call the now is, on this model, no more or less significant, and no more or less NOW, than any other moment in time. It only appears to be so, from our very limited, finite perspectives. From the perspective of eternity, however, each present is equally present. Plato refers to time in the Timaeus as a “moving image of eternity.” (Timaeus, 37d)

The final piece of the puncti-linear model of time comes from the historical moment of the scientific revolution, with the conceptual birth of absolute time. On the Modern view, time is not the Aristotelian measure of change; rather, the measure of change is how we typically perceive time. Time, in and of itself, however, just is, in the same way that space, on the Modern view, just is—it is mathematical, objectively uniform and unitary, and the same in all places, its units (or moments) unfolding with precise regularity. Though the term “absolute time” was officially introduced by Sir Isaac Newton in his Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica (1687), as that which “from its own nature flows equably without regard to anything external,” it is nevertheless clear that the experiments and theories of both Johannes Kepler and Galileo Galilei (both of whom historically preceded Newton) assume a model of absolute time. None other than René Descartes, the philosopher who did more than any other to usher in the modern sciences, writes in the third of his famous Meditations on First Philosophy, (where he argues for the existence of God) “for the whole time of my life may be divided into an infinity of parts, each of which is in no way dependent on any other...”

The puncti-linear model of time, then, conceives the whole of time as a series of now-points, or moments, each of which makes up something like an atom of time (as the physical atom is a unit of space). Each of those moments is ontologically and logically independent of every other, with the present moment being the now-point most alive. The past, then, is conceived as those presents that have come and gone, while the future is conceived as those presents that have not yet come, and insofar as we speak of past and future moments as occupying points of greater and lesser distances with respect to the present and to each other as well, we are, whether we realize it or not, conceiving of time as a linear progression; thus when we attempt to understand the essence of time, we tend to conceptually spatialize it. This prejudice is most easily seen in the ease with which our mind leaps to timelines in order to conceptualize relations of historical events.

Edmund Husserl, whose 1904-1905 lectures On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time probably did more to shape the future of the continental tradition in philosophy in the twentieth century than any other single text, was also very influential on the issue of time consciousness. There, Husserl constructs a model of time consciousness that he calls “the living present.” Whether or not there is any such thing as real time, or absolute time is, for Husserl, one of those questions that is bracketed in the performance of the phenomenological epochē; time, for Husserl, as everything else, is to be analyzed in terms of its objective qualities, in other words, in terms of how it is lived by a constituting subject. Husserl’s point of departure is to object to the theory of experience offered by Husserl’s mentor, Franz Brentano. Assuming (though not making explicit) the puncti-linear model of time, Brentano distinguishes between two basic types of experience. The primary mode is perception, which is the consciousness of the present now-point. All modes of the past are understood in terms of memory, which is the imagined recollection or representation of a now-moment no longer present. If you are asked to call to mind your celebration of your tenth birthday, you are employing the faculty of memory. And every mode of experience dealing with the past (or the no-longer-present), is understood by Brentano as memory.

This understanding presents a problem, though. From the moment you began reading the first word of this sentence, from, until this moment right now, as you are reading these words, there is a type of memory being employed. Indeed, in order to genuinely experience any given experience as an experience, and not just a random series of moments, there must be some operation of memory taking place. To cognize a song as a song, rather than a random series of notes, we must have some memory of the notes that have come just before, and so on. However, the type of memory that is being used here seems to be qualitatively different than the sort of memory employed when you are encouraged to reflect upon your tenth birthday, or even, to reflect upon what you had for dinner last night. This type of reflection, (or representation) is a calling-back-to-mind of an event that was experienced at some point in the past, but has long since left consciousness, while the other (the sort of memory it takes to cognize a sentence or a paragraph, for instance), is an operative memory of an event that has not yet left consciousness. Both are modes of memory, to be sure, but they are qualitatively different modes of memory, Husserl argues.

Moreover, in each moment of experience, we are at the same time looking forward to the future in some mode of expectation. This, too, is something we experience on a frequent basis. For instance, when walking through a door that we walk through frequently, we might casually tap the handle and lead with our head and shoulders because we expect that the door, unlocked, will open for us as it always does; when sitting at the bus stop, as the bus approaches the curb, we stand, because we expect that it is our bus, and that it is stopping to let us on. Our expectations are not quite as salient as are our primary memories, but they are there. All it takes is a rupture of some sort—the door may be locked, causing us to hit our head; the bus may not be our bus, or the driver may not see us and may continue driving—to realize that the structure of expectation was present in our consciousness.

Time, Husserl argues, is not experienced as a series of discrete, independent moments that arise and instantly die; rather, experience of the present is always thick with past and future. What Aristotle refers to as the now, Husserl calls the ‘primal impression,’ the moment of impact between consciousness and its intentional object, which is ever-renewed, but also ever-passing away; but the primal impression is constantly surrounded by a halo of retention (or primary memory) and protention (primary expectation). This structure, taken altogether, is what Husserl calls, “the living present.”

Derrida and Deleuze will each employ (while subjecting to strident criticism) Husserl’s concept of the living present. If the present is always constituted as a relation of past to future, then the very nature of time is itself relational, that is to say, it cannot be conceived as points on a line or as seconds on a clock. If time is essentially or structurally relational, then everything we think about ‘things’ (insofar as things are constituted in time), and knowledge (insofar as it takes place in time), will be radically transformed as well. To fully think through the implications of Husserl’s discovery entails a fundamental reorientation toward time and along with it, being. Deleuze employs the retentional-protentional structure of time, while discarding the notion of the primal impression. Derrida will stick with the terms of Husserl’s structure, while demonstrating that the present in Husserl is always infected with or contaminated by the non-present, the structure of which Derrida calls différance.

c. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics

In a sense it is difficult to talk in a synthetic way about what Deleuze and Derrida find wrong with traditional metaphysics, because they each, in the context of their own specific projects, find distinct problems with the history of metaphysics. However, the following is clear: (1) If we can use the term ‘metaphysics’ to characterize the attempt to understand the fundamental nature of things, and; (2) If we can acknowledge that traditionally the effort to do that has been carried out through the lenses of representational thinking in some form or other, then; (3) the critiques that Deleuze and Derrida offer against the history of metaphysical thinking are centered around the point that traditional metaphysics ultimately gets things wrong.

For Deleuze, this will come down to a necessary and fundamental imprecision that accompanies traditional metaphysics. Inasmuch as the task of metaphysics is to think the nature of the thing, and inasmuch as it sets for itself essentialist parameters for doing so, it necessarily filters its own understanding of the thing through conceptual representations, philosophy can never arrive at an adequate concept of the individual. To our heart’s desire, we may compound and multiply the concepts that we use to characterize a thing, but there will always necessarily be some aspect of that thing left untouched by thinking. Let us use a simple example, an inflated ball—we can describe it by as many representational concepts as we like: it is a certain color or a certain pattern, made of a certain material (rubber or plastic, perhaps), a certain size, it has a certain degree of elasticity, is filled with a certain amount of air, and so forth. However many categories or concepts we may apply to this ball, the nature of this ball itself will always elude us. Our conceptual characterization will always reach a terminus; our concepts can only go so far down. The ball is these characterizations, but it is also different from its characterizations as well. For Deleuze, if our ontology cannot reach down to the thing itself, if it is structurally and essentially incapable of comprehending the constitution of the thing, (as any substance metaphysics will be), then it is, for the most part, worthless as an ontology.

Derrida casts his critiques of the history of metaphysics in the Heideggerian language of presence. The history of philosophy, Derrida argues, is the metaphysics of presence, and the Western religious and philosophical tradition operates by categorizing being according to conceptual binaries: (good/evil, form/matter, identity/difference, subject/object, voice/writing, soul/body, mind/body, invisible/visible, life/death, God/Satan, heaven/earth, reason/passion, positive/negative, masculine/feminine, true/apparent, light/dark, innocence/fallenness, purity/contamination, and so forth.) Metaphysics consists of first establishing the binary, but from the moment it is established, it is already clear which of the two terms will be considered the good term and which the pejorative term—the good term is the one that is conceptually analogous to presence in either its spatial or temporal sense. The philosopher’s task, then, is to isolate the presence as the primary term, and to conceptually purge it of its correlative absent term.

A few examples will help elucidate this point: for Parmenides, divine wisdom entails an attempt to think that which is, at every present moment, the same. Heraclitean flux is the way of the masses. This in part shapes Plato’s emphasis on the eternality of the Form—while the material world changes with the passage of each new present, the Form remains the same, (ever-present or eternal); but in addition, the Form is also that which is closest to (a term of presence) the nature of the soul. In Plato the body, (given that it is in constant flux), is the prison of the soul, and in the Phaedo, life is declared a disease, for which death is the cure. In Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, the most complete happiness for the human being lies in the life of contemplation, because the capacity for contemplation is that which makes us most like the gods, (who are ever the same). So we would be happiest if we could contemplate all the time; however, we unfortunately cannot (as we also have bodies and so, various familial, social, and political responsibilities). In Christianity, the flesh is subject to change (which is the very essence of corruptibility) while the Spirit is incorruptible (or ever-present); for Descartes, (and for the early phenomenological tradition), only what is spatially present (that is, immediate to consciousness), is indubitable. Whether or not the object of my present perception exists in the so-called real world, it is nevertheless indubitable that I am experiencing what I am experiencing, in the moment at which I am experiencing it—Descartes even goes so far as to define clarity (one of his conditions for ‘truth’) as that which is present. And for Descartes, the body (insofar as it is at least possible to doubt its existence), is not most essentially me; rather, my soul is what I am. We saw Aristotle’s emphasis on the now, or the present, as the yardstick against which time is measured. The spatial and temporal senses of the emphasis on presence are completely solidified in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, whose phenomenological reduction attempts to focus its attention exclusively on the phenomena of consciousness, because only then can it accord with the philosophical demand for apodicticity; and he understands this experience as constituted on the model of the living present. In each of these cases, a presence is valorized, and its correlative absence is suppressed.

As was the case with Deleuze, however, Derrida will argue that the self-proclaimed task of metaphysics ultimately fails. Thus, (and against some of his more dismissive critics), Derrida operates in the name of truth—when the history of metaphysics posits that presence is primary, and absence secondary, this claim, Derrida shows, is false. Metaphysics, in all of its manifestations, attempts to cast out the impure, but somehow, the impure always returns, in the form of a supplementary term; the secondary term is always ultimately required in order to supplement the primary term. Derrida’s project then is dedicated to demonstrating that if the subordinate term is required in order to supplement the so-called primary term, it can only be because the primary term suffers always and originally from a lack or a deficiency of some sort. In other words, the absence that philosophy sought to cast out was present and infecting the present term from the origin.

3. Key Differential Ontologists

a. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist

It is in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, as we said above, that Derrida discovers the constitutive play known as différance. In its effort to isolate ideal essences, constituted within the sphere of consciousness, phenomenology brackets or suspends all questions having to do with the real existence of the external world, the belief in which Husserl refers to as the natural attitude. The natural attitude is the non-thematic subjective attitude that takes for granted the real existence of the real world, absent and apart from my (or any) experience of it. Science or philosophy, in the mode of the natural attitude, ontologically distinguishes being from our perceptions of being, from which point it becomes impossible to ever again bridge the gap between the two. Try as it might, philosophy in the natural attitude can only ever have representations of being, and certainty (the telos of philosophical activity) becomes untenable. With this in mind, we get Husserl’s famous principle of all principles: “that everything originarily… offered to us in ‘intuition’ is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there.” (Ideas I, §24) Husserl thus proposes a change in attitude, in what he calls the phenomenological epochē, which suspends all questions regarding the external existence of the objects of consciousness, along with the constituting priority of the empirical self. Both self and world are bracketed, revealing the correlative structure of the world itself in relation to consciousness thereof, opening a sphere of pure immanence, or, in Derrida’s terminology, pure presence. It is for this reason that Husserl represents for Derrida the most strident defense of the metaphysics of presence, and it is for this reason that his philosophy also serves as the ground out of which the notion of constitutive difference is discovered.

In his landmark 1967 text, Voice and Phenomenon, Derrida takes on Husserl’s notion of the sign. The sign, we should note, is typically understood as a stand-in for something that is currently absent. Linguistically a sign is a means by which a speaker conveys to a listener the meaning that currently resides within the inner experience of the speaker. The contents of one person’s experience cannot be transferred or related to the experience of a listener except through the usage of signs, (which we call ‘language’). Knowing this, and knowing that Husserl’s philosophy is an attempt to isolate a pure moment of presence, it is little wonder that he wants, inasmuch as it is possible, to do away with the usage of signs, and isolate an interior moment of presence. It is precisely this aim that Derrida takes apart.

In the opening chapter of Husserl’s First Logical Investigation, titled “Essential Distinctions,” Husserl draws a distinction between different types or functions of signs: expressions and indications. He claims signs are always pointing to something, but what they point to can assume different forms. An indication signifies without pointing to a sense or a meaning. The flu or bodily infection, for instance, is not the meaning of the fever, but it is brought to our attention by way of the fever—the fever, that is, points to an ailment in the body. An expression, however, is a sign that is, itself, charged with conceptual meaning; it is a linguistic sign. There are countless types of signs—animal tracks in the snow point to the recent presence of life, a certain aroma in the house may indicate that a certain food or even a certain ethnicity of food, is being prepared—but expressions are signs that are themselves meaningful.

This distinction (indication/expression) is itself problematic, however, and does not seem to be fundamentally sustainable. An indication may very well be an expression, and expressions are almost always indications. If one’s significant other leaves one a note on the table, for instance, before one has even read the words on the paper, the sheer presence of writing, left in a certain way, on a sheet of paper, situated a certain way on the table, indicates: (1) That the beloved is no longer in the house, and; (2) That the beloved has left one a message to be read. These signs are both indications and expressions. Furthermore, every time we use an expression of some sort, we are indicating something, namely, we are pointing toward an ideal meaning, empirical states of affairs, and so forth. In effect, one would be hard pressed to find a single example of a use of an expression that was not, in some sense, indicative.

Husserl, however, will argue that even if, in fact, expressions are always caught up in an indicative function, that this has nothing to do with the essential distinction, obtaining de jure (if not de facto) between indications and expressions. Husserl cannot relinquish this conviction because, after all, he is attempting to isolate a pure moment of self-presence of meaning. So if expressions are signs charged with meaning, then Husserl will be compelled to locate a pure form of expression, which will require the absolute separation of the expression from its indicative function. Indeed he thinks that this is possible. The reason expressions are almost always indicative is that we use them to communicate with others, and in the going-forth of the sign into the world, some measure of the meaning is always lost—no matter how many signs we use to articulate our experience, the experience can never be perfectly and wholly recreated within the mind of the listener. So to isolate the expressive essence of the expression, we must suspend the going-forth of the sign into the world. This is accomplished in the soliloquy of the inner life of consciousness.

In one’s interior monologue, there is nothing empirical, (nothing from the world), and hence, nothing indicative. The signs themselves have only ideal, not real, existence. Likewise, the signs employed in the interior monologue are not indicative in the way that signs in everyday communication are. Communicative expressions point us to states of affairs or the internal experiences of another person; in short, they point us to empirical events. Expressions of the interior monologue, however, do not point us to empirical realities, but rather, Husserl claims that in the interior expression, the sign points away from itself, and toward its ideal sense. For Husserl, therefore, the purest, most meaningful mode of expression is one in which nothing is, strictly speaking, expressed to anyone.

One might nevertheless wonder, is it not the case, that when one ‘converses’ internally with oneself, that one is, in some sense, articulating meaning to oneself? Here is a mundane example, one which has happened to each of us at some point in time: we walk into a room, and forget why we have entered the room. “Why did I come in here?” we might silently utter to ourselves, and after a moment, we might say to ourselves, “Ah, yes, I came in here to turn down the thermostat,” or something of the like. Is it not the case that the individual is communicating something to herself in this monologue?

Husserl responds in the negative. The signs we are using are not making known to the self a content that was previously inaccessible to the self, (which is what takes place in communication). In pointing away from itself and directly toward the sense, the sense is not conveyed from a self to a self, but rather, the sense of the expression is experienced by the subject at exactly that same moment in time.

This is where Derrida brings into the discussion Husserl’s notion of the living present, for this emphasis on the exact same moment in time relies upon Husserl’s notion of the primal impression. Derrida writes, “The sharp point of the instant, the identity of lived-experience present to itself in the same instant bears therefore the whole weight of this demonstration.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 51). In our discussion above of Husserl’s living present, we saw that the primal impression is constantly displaced by a new primal impression—it is in constant motion. Nevertheless, this does not keep Husserl from referring to the primal impression in terms of a point; it is, he says, the source-point on the basis of which retention is established. While the primal impression is always, as we saw with Husserl, surrounded by a halo of retention and protention, nevertheless this halo is always thought from the absolute center of the primal impression, as the source-point of experience. It is the “non-displaceable center, an eye or living nucleus” of temporality. (Voice and Phenomenon, 53)

This, we note, is the Husserlian manifestation of the emphasis on the temporal sense of presence in the philosophical tradition. Here, we should also note: Derrida never attempts to argue that philosophy should move away from the emphasis on presence. The philosophical tradition is defined by, Derrida claims, its emphasis on the present; the present provides the very foundation of certainty throughout the history of philosophy; it is certainty, in a sense. The present comprises an ineliminable essential element of the whole endeavor of philosophy. So to call it into question is not to try to bring a radical transformation to philosophy, but to shift one’s vantage point to one that inhabits the space between philosophy and non-philosophy. Indeed, Derrida motions in this direction, which is one of the reasons that Derrida is more comfortable than many traditional academic philosophers writing in the style of and in communication with literary figures. The emphasis on presence within philosophy, strictly speaking is incontestable.

Husserl, we saw, formulated his notion of the living present on the basis of his insistence on a qualitative distinction between retention as a mode of memory still connected to the present moment of consciousness, and representational memory, that deliberately calls to mind a moment of the past that has, since its occurrence, left consciousness. This means, for Husserl, that retention must be understood in the mode of Presentation, as opposed to Representation. Retention is a direct intuition of what has just passed, directly presented, and fully seen, in the moment of the now, as opposed to represented memory, which is not. Retention is not, strictly speaking, the present; the primal impression is the present. Nevertheless, retention is still attached to the moment of the now. Furthermore, there is a sense in which retention is necessary to give us the experience of the present as such. The primal impression, where the point of contact occurs, is in a constant mode of passing away, and the impression only becomes recognizable in the mode of retention—as we said, to truly experience a song as a song entails that one must keep in one’s memory the preceding few notes; but this is just another way of saying that the present is constituted in part on the basis of memory, even if memory of what has just passed.

Derrida diagnoses, then, a tension operating at the heart of Husserl’s thinking. On the one hand, Husserl’s phenomenology requires the sharp point of the instant in order to have a pure moment of self-presence, wherein meaning, without the intermediary of signs, can be found. In this sense, retention, though primary memory, is memory nonetheless, and does not give us the present, but is rather, Husserl claims, the “antithesis of perception.” (On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time, 41) Nevertheless, the present as such is only ever constituted on the basis of its becoming concretized and solidified in the acts that constitute the stretching out of time, in retention. Moreover, given that retention is still essentially connected to the primal impression, (which is itself always in the mode of passing away) there is not a radical distinction between retention and primal impression; rather, they are continuous, and the primal impression is really only, Husserl claims, an ideal limit. There is thus a continual accommodation of Husserlian presence to non-presence, which entails the admission of a form of otherness into the self-present now-point of experience. This accommodation is what keeps fundamentally distinct memory as retention and memory as representation.

Nevertheless, the common root, making possible both retention and representational memory, is the structural possibility of repetition itself, which Derrida calls the trace. The trace is the mark of otherness, or the necessary relation of interiority to exteriority. Husserl’s living present is marked by the structure of the trace, Derrida argues, because the primal impression for Husserl, never occurs without a structural retention attached to it. Thus, in the very moment, the selfsame point of time, when the primal impression is impressed within experience, what is essentially necessary to the structure, (in other words, not an accidental feature thereof), is the repeatability of the primal impression within retention. To be experienced in a primal impression therefore requires that the object of experience be repeatable, such that it can mark itself within the mode of retention, and ultimately, representational memory. Thus the primal impression is traced with exteriority, or non-presence, before it is ever empirically stamped.

On the basis of this trace that constitutes the presence of the primal impression, Derrida introduces the concept of différance:

[T]he trace in the most universal sense, is a possibility that must not only inhabit the pure actuality of the now, but must also constitute it by means of the very movement of the différance that the possibility inserts into the pure actuality of the now. Such a trace is, if we are able to hold onto this language without contradicting it and erasing it immediately, more ‘originary’ than the phenomenological originarity itself... In all of these directions, the presence of the present is thought beginning from the fold of the return, beginning from the movement of repetition and not the reverse. Does not the fact that this fold in presence or in self-presence is irreducible, that this trace or this différance is always older than presence and obtains for it its openness, forbid us from speaking of a simple self-identity ‘im selben Augenblick’? (Voice and Phenomenon, 58)

Différance, Derrida says, is a movement, a differentiating movement, on the basis of which the presence (the ground of philosophical certainty) is opened up. The self-presence of subjectivity, in which certainty is established, is inseparable from an experience of time, and the structural essentialities of the experience of time are marked by the trace. It is more originary than the primordiality of phenomenological experience, because it is what makes it possible in the first place. From this it follows, Derrida claims, that Husserl’s project of locating a moment of pure presence will be necessarily thwarted, because in attempting to rigorously think it through, we have found hiding behind it this strange structure signifying a movement and hence, not a this, that Derrida calls différance.

Using Derrida’s terminology, (which we shall presently dissect), we can say that différance is the non-originary, constituting-disruption of presence. Let us take this bit by bit. Différance is constituting—this signifies, as we saw in Husserl, that it is on the basis of this movement that presence is constituted. Derrida claims that it is the play of différance that makes possible all modes of presence, including the binary categories and concepts in accordance with which philosophy, since Plato, has conducted itself. That it is constitutive does not, however, mean that it is originary, at least not without qualification. To speak of origins, for Derrida, implies an engagement with a presumed moment of innocence or purity, in other words, a moment of presence, from which our efforts at meaning have somehow fallen away. Derrida says, rather, that différance is a “non-origin which is originary.” (“Freud and the Scene of Writing,” Writing and Difference, 203) Différance is, in a sense, an origin, but one that is already, at the origin, contaminated; hence it is a non-originary origin.

At the same time, because différance as play and movement always underlie the constitutive functioning of philosophical concepts, it likewise always attenuates this functioning, even as it constitutes it. Différance prevents the philosophical concepts from ever carrying out fully the operations that their author intends them to carry out. This constituting-disruption is the source of one of Derrida’s more (in)famous descriptions of the deconstructive project: “But this condition of possibility turns into a condition of impossibility.” (Of Grammatology, 74)

Différance attenuates both senses of presence to which we referred above: (1) Spatially, it differs, creating spaces, ruptures, chasms, and differences, rather than the desired telos of absolute proximity; (2) Temporally, it defers, delaying presence from ever being fully attained. Thus it is that Derrida, capitalizing on the “two motifs of the Latin differre...” will understand différance in the dual sense of differing and deferring (“Différance,” in Margins of Philosophy, 8)

Derrida is therefore a differential ontologist in that, through his critiques of the metaphysical tradition, he attempts to think the fundamental explicitly on the basis of a differential structure, reading the canonical texts of the philosophical tradition both with and against the intentions of their authors. In so doing, he attempts to expose the play of force underlying the constitution of meaning, and thereby, to open new trajectories of thinking, rethinking the very concept of the concept, and forging a path “toward the unnameable.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 66)

b. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist

As early as 1954, in one of Deleuze’s first publications, (a review of Jean Hyppolite’s book, Logic and Existence), Deleuze stresses the urgency for an ontology of pure difference, one that does not rely upon the notion of negation, because negation is merely difference, pushed to its outermost limit. An ontology of pure difference means an attempt to think difference as pure relation, rather than as a not-.

The reason for this urgency, as we saw above, is that the task of philosophy is to have a direct relation to things, and in order for this to happen, philosophy needs to grasp the thing itself, and this means, the thing as it differs from everything else that it is not, the thing as it essentially is. Reason, he claims, must reach down to the level of the individual. In other words, philosophy must attempt to think what he calls internal difference, or difference internal to Being itself. Above we noted that however many representational concepts we may adduce in order to characterize a thing, (our example above was a ball), so long as we are using concepts rooted in identity to grasp it, we will still be unable to think down to the level of what makes this, this. Therefore, philosophy suffers from an essential imprecision, which only differential ontology can repair.

This imprecision is rooted, Deleuze argues, in the Aristotelian moment, specifically in Aristotle’s metaphysics of analogy. Aristotle’s notion of metaphysics as first philosophy is that, while other sciences concentrate on one or another domain of being, metaphysics is to be the science of being qua being. Unlike every other science, (which all study some genus or species of being), the object of the metaphysical science, being qua being, is not a genus. This is because any given genus is differentiated (by way of differences) into species. Any species, beneath its given genus, is fully a member of that genus, but the difference that has so distinguished it, is not. Let us take an example: the genus animal. In this case, the difference, we might say, is rational, by which the genus animal is speciated into the species of man and beast, for Aristotle. Both man and beast are equally members of the genus animal, but rational, the differentia whereby they are separated, is not. Differentiae cannot belong, properly, to the given genus of which they are differentiae, and yet, differences exist, that is, they have being. Therefore, if differences have being, and the differentiae of any given genus cannot belong, properly speaking, to that genus, it follows that being cannot be a genus.

Metaphysics therefore cannot be the science of being as such, (because, given that there is no genus, ‘being,’ there is no being as such), but rather, of being qua being, or, put otherwise, the science that focuses on beings insofar as they are said to be. The metaphysician, Aristotle holds, must study being by way of abstraction—all that is is said to be in virtue of something common, and this commonality, Aristotle holds, is rooted in a thing’s being a substance, or a bearer of properties. The primary and common way in which a thing is said to be, Aristotle argues, is that it is a substance, a bearer of properties. Properties are, no doubt, but they are only to the extent that there is a substance there to bear them. There is no ‘red’ as such; there are only red things. Metaphysics, therefore, is the science that studies primarily the nature of what it means to be a substance, and what it means to be an attribute of a substance, but insofar as it relates to a substance. All of these other qualities, and along with them, the Aristotelian categories, are related analogically, through substances, to being. This explains Aristotle’s famous dictum: Being is said in many ways. (Metaphysics, IV.2) This is Aristotle’s doctrine known as the equivocity of being. Being is hierarchical in that there are greater and lesser degrees to which a thing may be said to be. In this sense, analogical being is a natural bedfellow with the theological impetus, in that it provides a means of speaking and thinking about God that does not flirt with heresy, that falls into neither of the two following traps: (1) Believing that a finite mind could ever possess knowledge of an infinite being; (2) Thinking that God’s qualities, for instance, his love or his mercy, are to be understood in like fashion to our own. Analogical being easily and naturally allows the Scholastic tradition to hierarchize the scala naturae, the great chain of being, thus creating a space in language and in thought for the ineffable.

Deleuze, however, will argue that the Aristotelian equivocity disallows ontology a genuine concept of Being, of the individual, or of difference itself: “However, this form of distribution commanded by the categories seemed to us to betray the nature of Being (as a cardinal and collective concept) and the nature of the distributions themselves (as nomadic rather than sedentary and fixed distributions), as well as the nature of difference (as individuating difference).” (Difference and Repetition, 269) By ‘cardinal’ and ‘collective,’ respectively, Deleuze means Being as the fundamental nature of what-is, (which is the individuating power of differentiation) and being as the whole of what-is. Analogical being, Deleuze objects, cannot think being as such (because being is not a genus, for Aristotle), and then, because it posits substances and categories (fixed, rather than fluid, models of distribution of being), it misses the nature of difference itself (because difference is always ‘filtered’ through a higher concept of identity), as well as the ability to think the individual (because thought can only go as far ‘down’ as the substance, which is always comprehended through our concepts). Thus, ontology, understood analogically, cannot do what it is designed to do: to think being.

To think a genuine concept of difference (and hence, being) requires an ontology which abandons the analogical model of being and affirms the univocity of being, that being is said in only one sense of everything of which it is said. Here, Deleuze cites three key figures that have made such a transformation in thinking possible: John Duns Scotus, Benedict de Spinoza, and Friedrich Nietzsche.

Deleuze calls Duns Scotus’ book, the Opus Oxoniense, “the greatest book of pure ontology.” (Difference and Repetition, 39) Scotus argues against Thomas Aquinas, and hence, against the Aristotelian doctrine of equivocity, in an effort to salvage the reliability of proofs for God’s existence, rooted, as they must be, in the experiences and the minds of human beings. Any argument that draws a conclusion about the being of God on the basis of some fact about his creatures presupposes, Scotus thinks, the univocal expression of the term, ‘being.’ If the being of God is wholly other, or even, analogous to, the being of man, then the relation of the given premises to the conclusion, “God exists,” thereby loses all validity. While, as noted, understanding being analogically affords the theological tradition a handy way of keeping the creation distinct from its creator, this same distance, Scotus thinks, also keeps us from truly possessing natural knowledge about God. So in order to save that knowledge, Scotus had to abolish the analogical understanding of being. However, Deleuze notes, in order to keep from falling into a heresy of another sort (namely, pantheism, the conviction that everything is God), Scotus had to neutralize univocal being. The abstract concept of being precedes the division into the categories of “finite” and “infinite,” so that, even if being is univocal, God’s being is nevertheless distinguished from man’s by way of God’s infinity. Being is therefore, univocal, but neutral and abstract, not affirmed.

Spinoza offers the next step in the affirmation of univocal being. Spinoza creates an elaborate ontology of expression and immanent causality, consisting of substance, attributes, and modes. There is but one substance, God or Nature, which is eternal, self-caused, necessary, and absolutely infinite. A given attribute is conceived through itself and is understood as constituting the essence of a substance, while a mode is an affection of a substance, a way a substance is. God is absolutely free because there is nothing outside of Nature which could determine God to act in such and such a way, so God expresses himself in his creation from the necessity of his own Nature. God’s nature is his power, and his power is his virtue. It is sometimes said that Spinoza’s God is not the theist’s God, and this is no doubt true, but it is equally true that Spinoza’s Nature is not the naturalist’s nature, because Spinoza equates Nature and God; in other words, he makes the world of Nature an object of worshipful admiration, or affirmation. Thus Spinoza takes the step that Scotus could not; nevertheless, Spinoza does not quite complete the transformation to the univocity of being. Spinoza leaves intact the priority of the substance over its modes. Modes can be thought only through substance, but the converse is not true. Thus for the great step Spinoza takes towards the immanentizing of philosophy, he leaves a tiny bit of transcendence untouched. Deleuze writes, “substance must itself be said of the modes and only of the modes.” (Difference and Repetition, 40)

This shift is made, Deleuze claims, with Nietzsche’s notion of eternal return. Deleuze understands Nietzsche’s eternal return in the terms of what Deleuze calls the disjunctive synthesis. In the disjunctive synthesis, we find the in itself of Deleuze’s notion of difference in itself. The eternal return, or the constant returning of the same as the different, constitutes systems, but these systems are, as we saw above, nomadic and fluid, constituted on the basis of disjunctive syntheses, which is itself a differential communication between two or more divergent series.

Given in experience, Deleuze claims, is diversity—not difference as such, but differences, different things, limits, oppositions, and so forth. But this experience of diversity presupposes, Deleuze claims, “a swarm of differences, a pluralism of free, wild, untamed differences; a properly differential and original space and time.” (Difference and Repetition, 50) In other words, the perceived, planar effects of limitations and oppositions presuppose a pure depth or a sub-phenomenal play of constitutive difference. Insofar as they are the conditions of space and time as we sense them, this depth that he is looking for is itself an imperceptible spatio-temporality. This depth (or ‘pure spatium’), he claims, is where difference, singularities, series, and systems, relate and interact. It is necessary, Deleuze claims, because the developmental and differential processes whereby living systems are constituted take place so rapidly and violently that they would tear apart a fully-formed being. Deleuze, comparing the world to an egg, argues that there are “systematic vital movements, torsions and drifts, that only the embryo can sustain: an adult would be torn apart by them.” (Difference and Repetition, 118)

At the embryonic level are series, with each series being defined by the differences between its terms, rather than its terms themselves. Rather, we should say that its terms are themselves differences, or what Deleuze calls intensities: “Intensities are implicated multiplicities, ‘implexes,’ made up of relations between asymmetrical elements.” (Difference and Repetition, 244). An intensity is essentially an energy, but an energy is always a difference or an imbalance, folded in on itself, an essentially elemental asymmetry. These intensities are the terms of a given series. The terms, however, are themselves related to other terms, and through these relations, these intensities are continuously modified. An intensity is an embryonic quantity in that its own internal resonance, which is constitutive of higher levels of synthesis and actualization, pulsates in a pure speed and time that would devastate a constituted being; it is for this reason that qualities and surface phenomena can only come to be on a plane in which difference as such is cancelled or aborted. In explicating its implicated differences, the system, so constituted, cancels out those differences, even if the differential ground rumbles beneath.

A system is formed whenever two or more of these heterogeneous series communicate. Insofar as each series is itself constituted by differences, the communication that takes place between the two heterogeneous series is a difference relating differences, a second-order difference, which Deleuze calls the differenciator, in that these differences relate, and in so relating, they differenciate first-order differences. This relation takes place through what Deleuze calls the dark precursor, comparing it to the negative path cleared for a bolt of lightning. Once this communication is established, the system explodes: “coupling between heterogeneous systems, from which is derived an internal resonance within the system, and from which in turn is derived a forced movement the amplitude of which exceeds that of the basic series themselves.” (Difference and Repetition, 117) The constitution of a series thus results in what we referred to above as the explication of qualities, which are themselves the results of a cancelled difference. Thus, Deleuze claims, the compounding or synthesis of these systems, series, and relations are the introduction of spatio-temporal dynamisms, which are themselves the sources of qualities and extensions.

The whole of being, ultimately, is a system, connected by way of these differential relations—difference relating to difference through difference—the very nature of Deleuze’s disjunctive synthesis. Difference in itself teems with vitality and life. As systems differentiate, their differences ramify throughout the system, and in so doing, series form new series, and new systems, de-enlisting and redistributing the singular points of interest and their constitutive and corresponding nomadic relations, which are themselves implicating, and, conversely, explicated in the phenomenal realm. The disjunctive synthesis is the affirmative employment of the creativity brought about by the various plays of differences. Against Leibniz’s notion of compossibility is opposed the affirmation of incompossibility. Leibniz defined the perfection of the cosmos in terms of its compossibility, and this in terms of a maximization of continuity. The disjunctive synthesis brings about the communication and cooperative disharmony of divergent and heterogeneous series; it does not, thereby, cancel the differences between them. Where incompossibility for Leibniz was a means of exclusion—an infinity of possible worlds excluded from reality on the basis of their incompossibility, in the hands of Deleuze, it becomes a means of opening the thing to the possible infinity of events. It is in this sense that Nietzsche’s eternal return is, for Deleuze, the affirmation of the return of the different, and hence, the affirmation, all of chance, all at once.

Finally, the eternal return is the name that Deleuze gives to the pulsating-contracting temporality according to which the pure spatium or depth differenciates. In Chapter 2 of Difference and Repetition, Deleuze employs the Husserlian discussion of the living present. However, unlike Derrida, Deleuze will simply discard Husserl’s notion of the primal impression—this term never makes an appearance in Difference and Repetition. Deleuze will argue that, with respect to time, the present is all there is, but the present itself is nothing more than the relation of retention to protention. If the present were truly present, (in the sense of a self-contained kernel of time, like Husserl’s primal impression), then, just as Aristotle noted, the present could never pass, because in order to pass, it would have to pass within another moment. The present can only pass, Deleuze claims, because the past is already in the present, reaching through the present, into the future, drawing the future into itself. Time, in other words, is nothing more than the contraction of past and future. The present, therefore, is the beating heart of difference in itself, but it is a present constituted on the basis of a differentiation.

Deleuze is therefore a differential ontologist in that he attempts to formulate a notion of difference that is: (1) The constitutive play of forces underlying the constitution of identities; (2) Purely relational, that is, non-negational, and hence, not in any way subordinate to the principle of identity. It is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of identity but in such a way as to not recreate the presuppositions surrounding identity at the level of the conditions themselves—it is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of real experience, the world as it is lived.

4. Conclusion

To briefly sum up, we can say that Derrida and Deleuze are the two key differential ontologists in the history of philosophy. While others before them were indeed thinkers of multiplicity, as opposed to thinkers of identity, none, so rigorously as Derrida and Deleuze, came to the conclusion that what was required in order to truly think multiplicity was an explicit formulation of a concept of difference, in itself. One of the key distinctions between the two of them, which explains many of their other differences, is their respective attitudes towards fidelity to the tradition of philosophy. While Derrida will understand fidelity to the tradition in the sense of embracing the presuppositions and prejudices of the tradition, using them, ultimately, to think beyond the tradition, but in such a way as to speak constantly of the end of metaphysics, and ultimately eschewing the adoption of any traditional philosophical terms such as ontology, being, and so forth; Deleuze, on the contrary, will understand fidelity to the philosophical tradition in the sense of embracing what philosophy has always sought to do, to think the fundamental, and will, in the name of this task, happily discard any presuppositions or prejudices that the tradition has attempted to bestow. So, while Derrida will, for instance, claim that the founding privilege of presence is not up for grabs in philosophy, but will, at the same time, avoid using terms like experience, being, ontology, concept, and so forth, Deleuze will claim that it is precisely the emphasis on presence (in the form of representational concepts and categories) that has kept philosophy from living up to its task. Therefore, the prejudice should be discarded. But that does not mean, Deleuze will argue, that we should give up metaphysics. If the old metaphysics no longer works, throw it out, and build a new one, from the ground up, if need be, but a new metaphysics, all the same.

5. References and Further Reading

The following is an annotated list of the key sources in which the differential ontologies of Derrida and Deleuze are formulated.

a. Primary Sources

  • Deleuze, Gilles. Bergsonism. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. New York: Zone Books, 1988.
    • Henri Bergson was a French “celebrity” philosopher in the early twentieth century, whose philosophy had very much fallen out of favor in France by the mid to late 1920s, as Husserlian phenomenology began to work its way into Paris. Deleuze’s 1966 text on Bergson played no small part in bringing Bergson back into fashion. In this text, Deleuze analyzes the Bergsonian notions of durée, memory, and élan vital, demonstrating the consistent trajectory of Bergson’s work from beginning to end, and highlighting the centrality of Bergson’s notion of time for the entirety of Deleuze’s thought.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Desert Islands and Other Texts (1953-1974). Ed. David Lapoujade, Trans. Michael Taormina. Los Angeles and New York: Semiotext(e), 2004.
    • This text contains many of Deleuze’s most important essays from his philosophically “formative” years. It contains his 1954 review of Jean Hyppolite’s Logic and Existence, as well as very early essays on Bergson. In addition, it contains interviews and round-table discussions surrounding the period leading up to and following the 1968 release of Difference and Repetition.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Difference and Repetition. Translated by Paul Patton. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
    • This is without question the most important book Deleuze ever wrote. It was his principal thesis for the Doctorat D’Etat in 1968, and it is in this text that the various elements that had emerged from his book-length engagements with other philosophers over the years come together into the critique of representation and the formulation of a differential ontology.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza. Translated by Martin Joughin. New York: Zone Books, 1992.
    • This book was his secondary, historical thesis in 1968, though there is good evidence that the book was actually first drafted in 1961-62, around the same time as the book on Nietzsche. The concept of expression, here analyzed in Spinoza, plays a very important role for Deleuze, and it is Spinoza who provides an alternative ontology of immanence which, contrary to that of Hegel, (quite prominent in mid-1960s France), does not rely upon the movement of negation, a concept that, for Deleuze, does not belong in the domain of ontology. As we saw in the article, Being is itself creative, and hence an object of affirmation, and to make negation an integral element in one’s ontology is, for Deleuze, antithetical to affirmation. Deleuze emphasizes expression, rather than negation. This emphasis already plays a role in the 1954 Review of Hyppolite (mentioned above).
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Kant’s Critical Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984.
    • In this 1963 text, Deleuze looks at the philosophy of Immanuel Kant, through the lens of the third CritiqueThe Critique of Judgment, arguing that Kant, (thanks in large part to Salomon Maimon) recognized the problems in the first two Critiques, and began attempting to correct them at the end of his life. In this text Deleuze examines Kant’s notion of the faculties, highlighting that by the time of the third Critique, (and unlike its two predecessors), the faculties are in a discordant accord—none legislating over the others.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. The Logic of Sense. Translated by Mark Lester with Charles Stivale. Edited by Constantin V. Boundas. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1990.
    • This text is interesting for a number of reasons. First, published in 1969, just one year following Difference and Repetition, it explores many of the same themes of Difference and Repetition, such as becomingtimeeternal returnsingularities, and so forth. At the same time, other themes, such as the event become centrally important, and these themes are now explored through the notion of sense. In a way it is in part a reorientation of Difference and Repetition. But one of the most important points to note is that the notion of the fractal subject is brought into conversation with psychoanalytic theory, and thus, this text forms a bridge between Deleuze’s earlier philosophical works and his political works with Félix Guattari, the first of which, Anti-Oedipus, was released just three years later, in 1972. In addition, the appendices in this volume include important essays on the reversal of Platonism, on the Stoics, and on Pierre Klossowski.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Nietzsche and Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1983.
    • This book, from 1962, was Deleuze’s second book. It may be a stretch to say that this book is the second most important book in Deleuze’s corpus. Nevertheless, it is certainly high on the list of importance. Here we see in their formational expressions, some of the motifs that will dominate all of Deleuze’s works up through The Logic of Sense. Among them are the rejection of negation, the articulation of the eternal return, the incompleteness of the Kantian critique, the purely relational ontology of force, which is the will to power, and so forth. This book lays out in very raw and accessible, (if somewhat underdeveloped) form some of the most significant criticisms later developed in Difference and Repetition.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Dissemination. Translated by Barbara Johnson. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This text was published in 1972, (along with Positions and Margins of Philosophy) as part of Derrida’s second publication blitz, (the first being in 1967). In addition to the titular essay, it contains the very important essay on Plato, “Plato’s Pharmacy.” Like much of what Derrida wrote, this text is extremely difficult, and probably not a good starter text for Derrida. Nonetheless, it’s one of his more important books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Edmund Husserl’s Origin of Geometry: An Introduction. Lincoln, Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press, 1989.
    • In 1962, Derrida translated an essay from very late in Husserl’s career, “The Origin of Geometry.” He also wrote a translator’s introduction to the essay—Husserl’s essay is about 18 pages long, while Derrida’s introduction is about 150 pages in length. This essay is of particular interest because it deals with the problem of how the ideal is constituted in the sphere of the subject; this will be a problem that will occupy Derrida up through the period of Voice and Phenomenon and beyond.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Margins of Philosophy. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1982.
    • This book is a collection of essays from the late-1960s up through the early 1970s, and is another from the 1972 publication blitz. It is very important for numerous reasons, but in no small part because it is here that his engagement with the work of Martin Heidegger, (which will occupy him throughout the remainder of his career), robustly begins. It contains some of the most important essays from Derrida’s mature work. Among them are the famous “Différance” essay, “The Ends of Man,” “Ousia and Grammē: Note on a Note from Being and Time,” “White Mythology,” (on the essential metaphoricity of language), and “Signature Event Context,” known for spawning the famous debate with John Searle over the work of J.L. Austin.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Of Grammatology. Translated by Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak. Baltimore and London: The JohnsHopkinsUniversity Press, 1974.
    • This book is one from the 1967 publication blitz, and is probably Derrida’s most famous work, among philosophers and non-philosophers alike. In addition, it is really one of the only book-length pieces Derrida wrote that is (at least the first part), merely programmatic and expository, as opposed to the prolonged engagements he typically undertakes with a particular text or thinker (the second part of the book is such an engagement, primarily with the thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau). In this book we get extended discussions of the history of metaphysics, logocentrism, the privilege of voice over writing in the tradition, différance, trace, and supplementarity. It is also in this text that the infamous quote, “There is no outside-text,” is found.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Positions. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This book is from the 1972 group, and is a very short collection of interviews. It is highly recommended as a good starting-point for those approaching Derrida for the first time. Here Derrida lays out in very straightforward, programmatic terms, the stakes of the deconstructive project, unencumbered by deep textual analysis.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Voice and Phenomenon. Trans. Leonard Lawlor. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2011.
    • This is probably the single most important book that Derrida wrote. It is, like most of the rest of his work, a textual engagement with Husserl. Nevertheless, Derrida concentrates on a few key passages of Husserl’s works, most of which are cited in the body of Derrida’s work, such that a very basic knowledge of the Husserlian project makes reading Derrida’s text quite possible. It is in his engagement with Husserl, and the deconstruction of consciousness, that Derrida formulates the key concepts of différancetrace, and supplementarity, that will govern the direction of his work for most of the rest of his career. Derrida himself claims (in Positions) that this is his favorite of his books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Writing and Difference. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1978.
    • This book is from the 1967 publication blitz, and it is a collection of Derrida’s early essays up through the mid-1960s. Here we get a very important essay on Michel Foucault that spawned the bitter fallout between the two for many years, the essay on Emmanuel Levinas that reoriented Levinas’ thinking, as well as demonstrated the broad and deep knowledge that Derrida had of the phenomenological tradition. In addition, this essay, “Violence and Metaphysics,” highlights the important role that Levinas will play in Derrida’s own thinking. There is also a very important essay on Freud and the trace, which is contemporaneous with the writing of Voice and Phenomenon.

b. Secondary Sources

There are many terrific volumes of secondary material on these two thinkers, but here are selected a few of the most relevant with respect to the themes explored in this article.

  • Bell, Jeffrey A. Philosophy at the Edge of Chaos. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2006.
  • Bell, Jeffrey A. The Problem of Difference: Phenomenology and Poststructuralism. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1998.
    • Both of Bell’s books deal with the question of difference, and situate, primarily Deleuze but Derrida as well, within the larger context of the history of philosophical attempts to think about difference, including Plato, Aristotle, Whitehead, Descartes, and Kant.
  • Bogue, Ronald. Deleuze and Guattari. London and New York: Routledge, 1989.
    • Bogue’s text was one of the earlier attempts to write a comprehensive introductory text that took into account Deleuze’s historical engagements, along with his own philosophical articulations of his concepts, and the later political and aesthetic texts as well. This text is still a ‘standard’.
  • Bryant, Levi. Difference and Givenness: Deleuze’s Transcendental Empiricism and the Ontology of Immanence. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2008.
    • Bryant’s is one of the best books on Deleuze in recent years. It focuses primarily on Difference and Repetition, but examines the concept of transcendental empiricism, what it means to attempt to think the conditions of real experience, through the lens of Deleuze’s previous interactions with the thinkers who informed the research of Difference and Repetition.
  • De Beistigui, Miguel. Truth and Genesis: Philosophy as Differential Ontology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2004.
    • De Beistigui, whose early works centered on the philosophy of Martin Heidegger, argues in this book that Deleuze completes the Heideggerian attempt to think difference, in that it is Deleuze who overcomes the humanism that Heidegger never quite escapes.
  • Descombes, Vincent. Modern French Philosophy. Trans. L. Scott-Fox and J.M. Harding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
    • Descombes’ book was one of the first to attempt to capture the heart of French philosophy in the wake of Bergson. It is still one of the best, especially given its brevity. Chapters 5 and 6 are particularly relevant.
  • Gasché, Rodolphe. The Tain of the Mirror: Derrida and the Philosophy of Reflection. Cambridge and London: HarvardUniversity Press, 1986.
    • Gasché’s text was one of the earliest and most forceful attempts to situate Derrida’s thinking in the context of an explicit philosophical problem, the problem of critical reflection, complete with a long philosophical history. In the Anglophone world, Derrida’s work was at this time explored mostly in the context of Literary Theory departments. While that gave Derrida something of a ‘head start’ over the reception of Deleuze in the United States, it also created the unfortunate impression, throughout academic philosophy, that Derrida’s project was one of merely ‘playing’ with canonical texts. Gasché’s book corrected that misconception, and to this day it remains one of the best texts for understanding the overall thrust of Derrida’s project.
  • Hägglund, Martin. Radical Atheism: Derrida and the Time of Life. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2008.
    • Hägglund’s book enters into the oft-discussed theme of Derrida’s so-called religious turn in his later period. It is one of the best recent books on Derrida’s thinking, taking up the implications of a fully immanent analysis of temporality.
  • Hughes, Joe. Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation. London: Continuum International Publishing Group, 2008.
    • This book is one of the first to take up a close comparison of Deleuze with the philosophy of Husserl, boldly arguing that Deleuze’s project is marked from start to finish with a certain phenomenological impetus.
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomenology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2002.
    • Lawlor was one of the first American scholars to emphasize the centrality of Husserl to Derrida’s work. This book is particularly helpful because, inasmuch as it deals with the entirety of Derrida’s engagement with Husserl (from 1953 up through Voice and Phenomenon and beyond), it provides a rigorous but accessible explication of the early formation of Derrida’s project. It is without question one of the best books on Derrida available.
  • Marrati, Paola. Genesis and Trace: Derrida Reading Husserl and Heidegger. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2005.
    • This book, first published in French in 1998, explores the origins of the deconstructive project in Derrida’s engagement with the phenomenological tradition, and more specifically, with the question of time. It demonstrates and articulates the lasting significance of the Husserlian problematic up through Derrida’s immersion into Heidegger’s thought, and beyond.
  • Smith, Daniel W. Essays on Deleuze. Edinburgh: EdinburghUniversity Press, 2012.
    • Smith has for years been one of the leading voices in the world when it comes to Deleuze, and this 2012 volume at last collects all of his most important essays on Deleuze, along with a few new ones. Of particular interest is the essay on the simulacrum, the one on univocity, the one on the conditions of the new, and the comparative essay on Deleuze and Derrida.

c. Other Sources Cited in this Article

  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 1. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 2. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Duns Scotus. Philosophical Writings—A Selection. Trans. Allan B. Wolter. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1987.
  • Heraclitus. Fragments: A Text and Translation with a Commentary By T.M. Robinson. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1987.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy. Trans. David Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, First Book. Trans. F. Kersten. Dordrecht, Boston, and London: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1998.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Logical Investigations Volume I. Ed. Dermot Moran. Trans. J.N. Findlay. New York: Routledge, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917). Trans. John Barnett Brough. Dordrecht, Boston, and London: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
  • Hyppolite, Jean. Logic and Existence. Trans. Leonard Lawlor and Amit Sen. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Parmenides. Fragments: A Text and Translation with an Introduction By David Gallop. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1984.
  • Plato. Complete Works. Ed. John M. Cooper. Associate Ed. D.S. Hutchinson. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
  • Spinoza. Complete Works. Ed. Michael L. Morgan. Trans. Samuel Shirley. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2002.


Author Information

Vernon W. Cisney
Gettysburg College
U. S. A.

Foucault, Michel: Political Thought

Michel Foucault: Political Thought

The work of twentieth-century French philosopher Michel Foucault has increasingly influenced the study of politics. This influence has mainly been via concepts he developed in particular historical studies that have been taken up as analytical tools; “governmentality” and ”biopower” are the most prominent of these. More broadly, Foucault developed a radical new conception of social power as forming strategies embodying intentions of their own, above those of individuals engaged in them; individuals for Foucault are as much products of as participants in games of power.

The question of Foucault’s overall political stance remains hotly contested. Scholars disagree both on the level of consistency of his position over his career, and the particular position he could be said to have taken at any particular time. This dispute is common both to scholars critical of Foucault and to those who are sympathetic to his thought.

What can be generally agreed about Foucault is that he had a radically new approach to political questions, and that novel accounts of power and subjectivity were at its heart. Critics dispute not so much the novelty of his views as their coherence. Some critics see Foucault as effectively belonging to the political right because of his rejection of traditional left-liberal conceptions of freedom and justice. Some of his defenders, by contrast, argue for compatibility between Foucault and liberalism. Other defenders see him either as a left-wing revolutionary thinker, or as going beyond traditional political categories.

To summarize Foucault’s thought from an objective point of view, his political works would all seem to have two things in common: (1) an historical perspective, studying social phenomena in historical contexts, focusing on the way they have changed throughout history; (2) a discursive methodology, with the study of texts, particularly academic texts, being the raw material for his inquiries. As such the general political import of Foucault’s thought across its various turns is to understand how the historical formation of discourses have shaped the political thinking and political institutions we have today.

Foucault’s thought was overtly political during one phase of his career, coinciding exactly with the decade of the 1970s, and corresponding to a methodology he designated “genealogy”. It is during this period that, alongside the study of discourses, he analysed power as such in its historical permutations. Most of this article is devoted to this period of Foucault’s work. Prior to this, during the 1960s, the political content of his thought was relatively muted, and the political implications of that thought are contested. So, this article is divided into thematic sections arranged in order of the chronology of their appearance in Foucault’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Foucault’s Early Marxism
  2. Archaeology
  3. Genealogy
  4. Discipline
  5. Sexuality
  6. Power
  7. Biopower
  8. Governmentality
  9. Ethics
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary
    2. Secondary

1. Foucault’s Early Marxism

Foucault began his career as a Marxist, having been influenced by his mentor, the Marxist philosopher Louis Althusser, as a student to join the French Communist Party. Though his membership was tenuous and brief, Foucault’s later political thought should be understood against this background, as a thought that is both under the influence of, and intended as a reaction to, Marxism.

Foucault himself tells us that after his early experience of a Stalinist communist party, he felt sick of politics, and shied away from political involvements for a long time. Still, in his first book, which appeared in 1954, less than two years after Foucault had left the Party, his theoretical perspective remained Marxist. This book was a history of psychology, published in English as Mental Illness and Psychology. In the original text, Foucault concludes that mental illness is a result of alienation caused by capitalism. However, he excised this Marxist content from a later edition in 1962, before suppressing publication of the book entirely; an English translation of the 1962 edition continues to be available only by an accident of copyright (MIP vii). Thus, one can see a trajectory of Foucault’s decisively away from Marxism and indeed tendentially away from politics.

2. Archaeology

Foucault’s first major, canonical work was his 1961 doctoral dissertation, The History of Madness. He gives here a historical account, repeated in brief in the 1962 edition of Mental Illness and Psychology, of what he calls the constitution of an experience of madness in Europe, from the fifteenth to the nineteenth centuries. This encompasses correlative study of institutional and discursive changes in the treatment of the mad, to understand the way that madness was constituted as a phenomenon. The History of Madness is Foucault’s longest book by some margin, and contains a wealth of material that he expands on in various ways in much of his work of the following two decades. Its historical inquiry into the interrelation of institutions and discourses set the pattern for his political works of the 1970s.

Foucault saw there as being three major shifts in the treatment of madness in the period under discussion. The first, with the Renaissance, saw a new respect for madness. Previously, madness had been seen as an alien force to be expelled, but now madness was seen as a form of wisdom. This abruptly changed with the beginning of the Enlightenment in the seventeenth century. Now rationality was valorized above all else, and its opposite, madness, was excluded completely. The unreasonable was excluded from discourse, and congenitally unreasonable people were physically removed from society and confined in asylums. This lasted until the end of the eighteenth century, when a new movement “liberating” the mad arose. For Foucault, however, this was no true liberation, but rather the attempt by Enlightenment reasoning to finally negate madness by understanding it completely, and cure it with medicine.

The History of Madness thus takes seriously the connection between philosophical discourse and political reality. Ideas about reason are not merely taken to be abstract concerns, but as having very real social implications, affecting every facet of the lives of thousands upon thousands of people who were considered mad, and indeed, thereby, altering the structure of society. Such a perspective represents a change in respect of Foucault’s former Marxism. Rather than attempt to ground experience in material circumstances, here it might seem that cultural transformation is being blamed for the transformation of society. That is, it might seem that Foucault had embraced idealism, the position that ideas are the motor force of history, Marxism’s opposite. This would, however, be a misreading. The History of Madness posits no causal priority, either of the cultural shift over the institutional, or vice versa. It simply notes the coincident transformation, without etiological speculation. Moreover, while the political forces at work in the history of madness were not examined by Foucault in this work, it is clearly a political book, exploring the political stakes of philosophy and medicine.

Many were convinced that Foucault was an idealist, however, by later developments in his thought. After The History of Madness, Foucault began to focus on the discursive, bracketing political concerns almost entirely. This was first, and most clearly, signalled in the preface to his next book, The Birth of the Clinic. Although the book itself essentially extends The History of Madness chronologically and thematically, by examining the birth of institutional medicine from the end of the eighteenth century, the preface is a manifesto for a new methodology that will attend only to discourses themselves, to the language that is uttered, rather than the institutional context. It is the following book in Foucault’s sequence, rather than The Birth of the Clinic itself, that carried this intention to fulfilment: this book was The Order of Things (1966). Whereas in The History of Madness and The Birth of the Clinic, Foucault had pursued historical researches that had been relatively balanced between studying conventional historical events, institutional change, and the history of ideas, The Order of Things represented an abstract history of thought that ignored almost anything outside the discursive. This method was in effect what was at that time in France called “structuralism,” though Foucault was never happy with this use of this term. His specific claims were indeed quite unique, namely that in the history of academic discourses, in a given epoch, knowledge is organized by an episteme, which governs what kind of statements can be taken as true. The Order of Things charts several successive historical shifts of episteme in relation to the human sciences.

These claims led Foucault onto a collision with French Marxism. This could not have been entirely unintended by Foucault, in particular because in the book he specifically accuses Marxism of being a creature of the nineteenth century that was now obsolete. He also concluded the work by indicating his opposition to humanism, declaring that “man” (the gendered “man” here refers to a concept that in English we have come increasingly to call the “human”) as such was perhaps nearing obsolescence. Foucault here was opposing a particular conception of the human being as a sovereign subject who can understand itself. Such humanism was at that time the orthodoxy in French Marxism and philosophy, championed the pre-eminent philosopher of the day, Jean-Paul Sartre, and upheld by the French Communist Party’s central committee explicitly against Althusser just a month before The Order of Things was published (DE1 36). In its humanist form, Marxism cast itself as a movement for the full realization of the individual. Foucault, by contrast, saw the notion of the individual as a recent and aberrant idea. Furthermore, his entire presumption to analyse and criticize discourses without reference to the social and economic system that produced them seemed to Marxists to be a massive step backwards in analysis. The book indeed seems to be apolitical: it refuses to take a normative position about truth, and accords no importance to anything outside abstract, academic discourses. The Order of Things proved so controversial, its claims so striking, that it became a best-seller in France, despite being a lengthy, ponderous, scholarly tome.

Yet, Foucault’s position is not quite as anti-political as has been imagined. The explicit criticism of Marxism in the book was specifically of Marx’s economic doctrine: it amounts to the claim that this economics is essentially a form of nineteenth century political economy. It is thus not a total rejection of Marxism, or dismissal of the importance of economics. His anti-humanist position was not in itself anti-Marxist, inasmuch as Althusser took much the same line within a Marxist framework, albeit one that tended to challenge basic tenets of Marxism, and which was rejected by the Marxist establishment. This shows it is possible to use the criticism of the category of “man” in a pointedly political way. Lastly, the point of Foucault’s “archaeological” method of investigation, as he now called it, of looking at transformations of discourses in their own terms without reference to the extra-discursive, does not imply in itself that discursive transformations can be explained without reference to anything non-discursive, only that they can be mapped without any such reference. Foucault thus shows a lack of interest in the political, but no outright denial of the importance of politics.

Foucault was at this time fundamentally oriented towards the study of language. This should not in itself be construed as apolitical. There was a widespread intellectual tendency in France during the 1960s to focus on avant-garde literature as being the main repository for radical hopes, eclipsing a traditional emphasis on the politics of the working class. Foucault wrote widely during this period on art and literature, publishing a book on the obscure French author Raymond Roussel, which appeared on the same day as The Birth of the Clinic. Given Roussel’s eccentricity, this was not far from his reflections on literature in The History of Madness. For Foucault, modern art and literature are essentially transgressive. Transgression is something of a common thread running through Foucault’s work in the 1960s: the transgression of madness and literary modernism is for Foucault directly implicated in the challenge he sees emerging to the current episteme. This interest in literature culminated in what is perhaps Foucault’s best known piece in this relation, ”What Is an Author?”, which combines some of the themes from his final book of the sixties, The Archaeology of Knowledge, with reflections on modern literature in challenging the notion of the human “author” of a work in whatever genre. All of these works, no matter how abstract, can be seen as having important political-cultural stakes for Foucault. Challenging the suzerainty of “man” can in itself be said to have constituted his political project during this period, such was the importance he accorded to discourses. The practical importance of such questions can be seen in The History of Madness.

Foucault was ultimately dissatisfied with this approach, however. The Archaeology of Knowledge, a reflective consideration of the methodology of archaeology itself, ends with an extraordinary self-critical dialogue, in which Foucault answers imagined objections to this methodology.

3. Genealogy

Foucault wrote The Archaeology of Knowledge while based in Tunisia, where he had taken a three-year university appointment in 1966. While the book was in its final stages, the world around him changed. Tunisia went through a political upheaval, with demonstrations against the government, involving many of his students. He was drawn into supporting them, and was persecuted as a result. Much better known and more significant student demonstrations occurred in Paris shortly afterwards, in May of 1968. Foucault largely missed these because he was in Tunis, but he followed news of them keenly.

He returned to France permanently in 1969. He was made the head of the philosophy department at a brand new university at Vincennes. The milieu he found on his return to France was itself highly politicized, in stark contrast to the relatively staid country he had left behind three years before. He was surrounded by peers who had become committed militants, not least his partner Daniel Defert, and including almost all of the colleagues he had hired to his department. He now threw himself into an activism that would characterize his life from that point on.

It was not long before a new direction appeared in his thought to match. The occasion this first became apparent was his 1970 inaugural address for another new job, his second in as many years, this time as a professor at the Collège de France, the highest academic institution in France. This address was published as a book in France, L’ordre du discours, “The Order of Discourse” (which is one of the multiple titles under which it has been translated in English). For the first time, Foucault sets out an explicit agenda of studying institutions alongside discourse. He had done this in the early 1960s, but now he proposed it as a deliberate method, which he called “genealogy.” Much of “The Order of Discourse” in effect recapitulates Foucault’s thought up to that point, the considerations of the history of madness and the regimes of truth that have governed scientific discourse, leading to a sketch of a mode of analysing discourse similar to that of The Archeology of Knowledge. In the final pages, however, Foucault states that he will now undertake analyses in two different directions, critical and “genealogical.” The critical direction consists in the study of the historical formation of systems of exclusion. This is clearly a turn back to the considerations of The History of Madness. The genealogical direction is more novel – not only within Foucault’s work, but in Western thought in general, though the use of the term “genealogical” does indicate a debt to one who came before him, namely Friedrich Nietzsche. The genealogical inquiry asks about the reciprocal relationship between systems of exclusion and the formation of discourses. The point here is that exclusion is not a fate that befalls innocent, pre-existing discourses. Rather, discourses only ever come about within and because of systems of exclusion, the negative moment of exclusion co-existing with the positive moment of the production of discourse. Now, discourse becomes a political question in a full sense for Foucault, as something that is intertwined with power.

“Power” is barely named as such by Foucault in this text, but it becomes the dominant concept of his output of the 1970s. This output comprises two major books, eight annual lecture series he gave at the Collège de France, and a plethora of shorter pieces and interviews. The signature concept of genealogy, combining the new focus on power with the older one on discourse, is his notion of “power-knowledge.” Foucault now sees power and knowledge as indissolubly joined, such that one never has either one without the other, with neither having causal suzerainty over the other.

His first lecture series at the Collège de France, now published in French as Leçons sur la volonté de savoir (“Lessons on the will to knowledge”), extends the concerns of “The Order of Discourse” with the production of knowledge. More overtly political material followed in the next two lecture series, between 1971 and 1973, both of which dealt with the prison system, and led up to Foucault’s first full-scale, published genealogy, 1975’s Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison.

4. Discipline

This research on prisons began in activism. The French state had banned several radical leftist groups in the aftermath of May 1968, and thousands of their members ended up in prisons, where they began to agitate for political rights for themselves, then began to agitate for rights for prisoners in general, having been exposed by their incarceration to ordinary prisoners and their problems. Foucault was the main organizer of a group formed outside the prison, in effect as an outgrowth of this struggle, the Groupe d’informations sur les prisons (the GIP – the Prisons Information Group). This group, composed primarily of intellectuals, sought simply to empower prisoners to speak of their experiences on their own account, by sending surveys out to them and collating their responses.

In tandem with this effort, Foucault researched the history of the prisons, aiming to find out something that the prisoners themselves could not tell him: how the prison system had come into being and what purpose it served in the broader social context. His history of the prisons turns out to be a history of a type of power that Foucault calls “disciplinary,” which encompasses the modern prison system, but is much broader. Discipline and Punish thus comprises two main historical theses. One, specifically pertaining to the prison system, is that this system regularly produces an empirically well-known effect, a layer of specialized criminal recidivists. This is for Foucault simply what prisons objectively do. Pointing this out undercuts the pervasive rationale of imprisonment that prisons are there to reduce crime by punishing and rehabilitating inmates. Foucault considers the obvious objection to this that prisons only produce such effects because they have been run ineffectively throughout their history, that better psychological management of rehabilitation is required, in particular. He answers this by pointing out that such discourses of prison reform have accompanied the prison system since it was first established, and are hence part of its functioning, indeed propping it up in spite of its failures by providing a constant excuse for its failings by arguing that it can be made to work differently.

Foucault’s broader thesis in Discipline and Punish is that we are living in a disciplinary society, of which the prison is merely a potent example. Discipline began not with the prisons, but originally in monastic institutions, spreading out through society via the establishment of professional armies, which required dressage, the training of individual soldiers in their movements so that they could coordinate with one another with precision. This, crucially, was a matter of producing what Foucault calls “docile bodies,” the basic unit of disciplinary power. The prison is just one of a raft of broadly similar disciplinary institutions that come into existence later. Schools, hospitals, and factories all combine similar methods to prisons for arranging bodies regularly in space, down to their minute movements. All combine moreover similar functions. Like the prison, they all have educational, economically productive, and medical aspects to them. The differences between these institutions is a matter of which aspect has primacy.

All disciplinary institutions also do something else that is quite novel, for Foucault: they produce a “soul” on the basis of the body, in order to imprison the body. This eccentric formulation of Foucault’s is meant to capture the way that disciplinary power has increasingly individualized people. Discipline and Punish begins with a vivid depiction of an earlier form of power in France, specifically the execution in 1757 of a man who had attempted to kill the King of France. As was the custom, for this, the most heinous of crimes in a political system focused on the person of the king, the most severe punishment was meted out: the culprit was publicly tortured to death. Foucault contrasts this with the routinized imprisonment that became the primary form of punishing criminals in the 19th century. From a form of power that punished by extraordinary and exemplary physical harm against a few transgressors, Western societies adopted a form of power that attempted to capture all individual behaviour. This is illustrated by a particular example that has become one of the best known images from Foucault’s work, the influential scheme of nineteenth century philosopher Jeremy Bentham called the “Panopticon,” a prison in which every action of the inmates would be visible. This serves as something of a paradigm for the disciplinary imperative, though it was never realized completely in practice.

Systems of monitoring and control nevertheless spread through all social institutions: schools, workplaces, and the family. While criminals had in a sense already been punished individually, they were not treated as individuals in the full sense that now developed. Disciplinary institutions such as prisons seek to develop detailed individual psychological profiles of people, and seek to alter their behaviour at the same level. Where previously most people had been part of a relatively undifferentiated mass, individuality being the preserve of a prominent or notorious few, and even then a relatively thin individuality, a society of individuals now developed, where everyone is supposed to have their own individual life story. This constitutes the soul Foucault refers to.

5. Sexuality

The thread of individualization runs through his next book, the first of what were ultimately three volumes of his History of Sexuality. He gave this volume the title The Will to Knowledge. It appeared only a year after Discipline and Punish. Still, three courses at the Collège de France intervene between his lectures on matters penitential and the book on sexuality. The first, Psychiatric Power, picks up chronologically where The History of Madness had left off, and applies Foucault’s genealogical method to the history of psychiatry. The next year, 1975, Foucault gave a series of lectures entitled Abnormal. These link together the studies on the prison with those on psychiatry and the question of sexuality through the study of the category of the abnormal, to which criminals, the mad, and sexual “perverts” were all assigned. Parts of these lectures indeed effectively reappear in The Will to Knowledge.

Like Discipline and Punish, the Will to Knowledge contains both general and specific conclusions. Regarding the specific problem of sexuality, Foucault couches his thesis as a debunking of a certain received wisdom in relation to the history of sexuality that he calls “the repressive hypothesis.” This is the view that our sexuality has historically been repressed, particularly in the nineteenth century, but that during the twentieth century it has been progressively liberated, and that we need now to get rid of our remaining hang-ups about sex by talking openly and copiously about it. Foucault allows the core historical claim that there has been sexual repressiveness, but thinks that this is relatively unimportant in the history of sexuality. Much more important, he thinks, is an injunction to talk about our sexuality that has consistently been imposed even during the years of repressiveness, and is now intensified, ostensibly for the purpose of lifting our repression. Foucault again sees a disciplinary technique at work, namely confession. This began in the Catholic confessional, with the Church spreading the confessional impulse in relation to sex throughout society in the early modern period. Foucault thinks this impulse has since been made secular, particularly under the auspices of institutional psychiatry, introducing a general compulsion for everyone to tell the truth about themselves, with their sexuality a particular focus. For Foucault, there is no such thing as sexuality apart from this compulsion. That is, sexuality itself is not something that we naturally have, but rather something that has been invented and imposed.

The implication of his genealogy of sexuality is that “sex” as we understand it is an artificial construct within this recent “device” (dispositif) of sexuality. This includes both the category of the sexual, encompassing certain organs and acts, and “sex” in the sense of gender, an implication spelt out by Foucault in his introduction to the memoirs of Herculine Barbin, a nineteenth century French hermaphrodite, which Foucault discovered and arranged to have published. Foucault’s thought, and his work on sexuality in particular, has been immensely influential in the recent “third wave” of feminist thought. The interaction of Foucault and feminism is the topic of a dedicated article elsewhere in this encyclopedia.

6. Power

The most general claim of The Will to Knowledge, and of Foucault’s entire political thought, is his answer to the question of where machinations such as sex and discipline come from. Who and what is it that is responsible for the production of criminality via imprisonment? Foucault’s answer is, in a word, “power.” That is to say that no one in particular is producing these things, but that rather they are effects generated by the interaction of power relations, which produce intentions of their own, not necessarily shared by any individuals or institutions. Foucault’s account of power is the broadest of the conclusions of The Will to Knowledge. Although similar reflections on power can be found in Discipline and Punish and in lectures and interviews of the same period, The Will to Knowledge gives his most comprehensive account of power. Foucault understands power in terms of “strategies” which are produced through the concatenation of the power relations that exist throughout society, wherever people interact. As he explains in a later text, “The Subject and Power,” which effectively completes the account of power given in The Will to Knowledge, these relations are a matter of people acting on one another to make other people act in turn. Whenever we try to influence others, this is power. However, our attempts to influence others rarely turn out the way we expect; moreover, even when they do, we have very little idea what effects our actions on others’ have more broadly. In this way, the social effects of our attempts to influence other people run quite outside of our control or ken. This effect is neatly encapsulated in a remark attributed to Foucault that we may know what we do, but we do not know what what we do does. What it does is produce strategies that have a kind of life of their own. Thus, although no one in the prison system, neither the inmates, nor the guards, nor politicians, want prisons to produce a class of criminals, this is nonetheless what the actions of all the people involved do.

Controversy around Foucault’s political views has focused on his reconception of power. Criticisms of him on this point invariably fail, however, to appreciate his true position or beg the question against it by simply restating the views he has rejected. He has been interpreted as thinking that power is a mysterious, autonomous force that exists independently of any human influence, and is so all-encompassing as to preclude any resistance to it. Foucault clearly states in The Will to Knowledge that this is not so, though it is admittedly relatively difficult to understand his position, namely that resistance to power is not outside power. The point here for Foucault is not that resistance is futile, but that power is so ubiquitous that in itself it is not an obstacle to resistance. One cannot resist power as such, but only specific strategies of power, and then only with great difficulty, given the tendency of strategies to absorb apparently contradictory tendencies. Still, for Foucault power is never conceived as monolithic or autonomous, but rather is a matter of superficially stable structures emerging on the basis of constantly shifting relations underneath, caused by an unending struggle between people. Foucault explains this in terms of the inversion of Clausewitz’s dictum that war is diplomacy by other means into the claim that “politics is war by other means.” For Foucault, apparently peaceful and civilized social arrangements are supported by people locked in a struggle for supremacy, which is eternally susceptible to change, via the force of that struggle itself.

Foucault is nevertheless condemned by many liberal commentators for his failure to make any normative distinction between power and resistance, that is, for his relativism. This accusation is well founded: he consistently eschews any kind of overtly normative stance in his thought. He thus does not normatively justify resistance, but it is not clear there is any inherent contradiction in a non-normative resistance. This idea is coherent, though of course those who think it is impossible to have a non-normative political thought (which is a consensus position within political philosophy) will reject him on this basis. For his part, he offers only analyses that he hopes will prove useful to people struggling in concrete situations, rather than prescriptions as to what is right or wrong.

One last accusation, coming from a particularly noteworthy source, the most prominent living German philosopher, Jürgen Habermas, should also be mentioned. This accusation is namely that Foucault’s account of power is “functionalist.” Functionalism in sociology means taking society as a functional whole and thus reading every part as having distinct functions. The problem with this view is that society is not designed by anyone and consequently much of it is functionally redundant or accidental. Foucault does use the vocabulary of “function” on occasion in his descriptions of the operations of power, but does not show any allegiance to or even awareness of functionalism as a school of thought. His position in any case is not that society constitutes a totality or whole via any necessity: functions exist within strategies that emerge spontaneously from below, and the functions of any element are subject to change.

7. Biopower

Foucault’s position in relation to resistance implies not so much that one is defeated before one begins as that one must proceed with caution to avoid simply supporting a strategy of power while thinking oneself rebellious. This is for him what has happened in respect of sexuality in the case of the repressive hypothesis. Though we try to liberate ourselves from sexual repression, we in fact play into a strategy of power which we do not realize exists. This strategy is for everyone to constitute themselves as “‘subjects’ in both senses of the word,” a process Foucault designates “subjection” (assujettissement). The two senses here are passive and active. On the one hand, we are subjected in this process, made into passive subjects of study by medical professionals, for example. On the other, we are the subjects in this process, having to actively confess our sexual proclivities and indeed in the process develop an identity based on this confessed sexuality. So, power operates in ways that are both overtly oppressive and more positive.

Sexuality for Foucault has a quite extraordinary importance in the contemporary network of power relations. It has become the essence of our personal identity, and sex has come to be seen as “worth dying for.” Foucault details how sexuality had its beginnings as a preoccupation of the newly dominant bourgeois class, who were obsessed with physical and reproductive health, and their own pleasure. This class produced sexuality positively, though one can see that it would have been imposed on women and children within that class quite regardless of their wishes. For Foucault, there are four consistent strategies of the device of sexuality: the pathologisation of the sexuality of women and children, the concomitant medicalization of the sexually abnormal “pervert,” and the constitution of sexuality as an object of public concern. From its beginning in the bourgeoisie, Foucault sees public health agencies as imposing sexuality more crudely on the rest of the populace, quite against their wishes.

Why has this happened? For Foucault, the main explanation is how sexuality ties together multiple “technologies of power”, namely discipline on the one hand, and a newer technology, which he calls “bio-politics,” on the other. In The Will to Knowledge, Foucault calls this combination of discipline and bio-politics together “bio-power,” though confusingly he elsewhere seems to use “bio-power” and “bio-politics” as synonyms, notably in his 1976 lecture series, Society Must Be Defended. He also elsewhere dispenses with the hyphens in these words, as it will in the present article hereafter.

Biopolitics is a technology of power that grew up on the basis of disciplinary power. Where discipline is about the control of individual bodies, biopolitics is about the control of entire populations. Where discipline constituted individuals as such, biopolitics does this with the population. Prior to the invention of biopolitics, there was no serious attempt by governments to regulate the people who lived in a territory, only piecemeal violent interventions to put down rebellions or levy taxes. As with discipline, the main precursor to biopolitics can be found in the Church, which is the institution that did maintain records of births and deaths, and did minister to the poor and sick, in the medieval period. In the modern period, the perception grew among governments that interventions in the life of the people would produce beneficial consequences for the state, preventing depopulation, ensuring a stable and growing tax base, and providing a regular supply of manpower for the military. Hence they took an active interest in the lives of the people. Disciplinary mechanisms allowed the state to do this through institutions, most notably perhaps medical institutions that allowed the state to monitor and support the health of the population. Sex was the most intense site at which discipline and biopolitics intersected, because any intervention in population via the control of individual bodies fundamentally had to be about reproduction, and also because sex is one of the major vectors of disease transmission. Sex had to be controlled, regulated, and monitored if the population was to be brought under control.

There is another technology of power in play, however, older than discipline, namely “sovereign power.” This is the technology we glimpse at the beginning of Discipline and Punish, one that works essentially by violence and by taking, rather than by positively encouraging and producing as both discipline and biopolitics do. This form of power was previously the way in which governments dealt both with individual bodies and with masses of people. While it has been replaced in these two roles by discipline and biopower, it retains a role nonetheless at the limits of biopower. When discipline breaks down, when the regulation of the population breaks down, the state continues to rely on brute force as a last resort. Moreover, the state continues to rely on brute force, and the threat of it, in dealing with what lies outside its borders.

For Foucault, there is a mutual incompatibility between biopolitics and sovereign power. Indeed, he sometimes refers to sovereign power as “thanatopolitics,” the politics of death, in contrast to biopolitics’s politics of life. Biopolitics is a form of power that works by helping you to live, thanatopolitics by killing you, or at best allowing you to live. It seems impossible for any individual to be simultaneously gripped by both forms of power, notwithstanding a possible conflict between different states or state agencies. There is a need for a dividing line between the two, between who is to be “made to live,” as Foucault puts it, and who is to be killed or simply allowed to go on living indifferently. The most obvious dividing line is the boundary between the population and its outside at the border of a territory, but the “biopolitical border,” as it has been called by recent scholars, is not the same as the territorial border. In Society Must Be Defended, Foucault suggests there is a device he calls “state racism,” that comes variably into play in deciding who is to receive the benefits of biopolitics or be exposed to the risk of death.

Foucault does not use this term in any of the works he published himself, but nevertheless does point in The Will to Knowledge to a close relationship between biopolitics and racism. Discourses of scientific racism that emerged in the nineteenth century posited a link between the sexual “degeneracy” of individuals and the hygiene of the population at large. By the early twentieth century, eugenics, the pseudo-science of improving the vitality of a population through selective breeding, was implemented to some extent in almost all industrialized countries. It of course found its fullest expression in Nazi Germany. Nevertheless, Foucault is quite clear that there is something quite paradoxical about such attempts to link the old theme of “blood” to modern concerns with population health. The essential point about “state racism” is not then that it necessarily links to what we might ordinarily understand as racism in its strict sense, but that there has to be a dividing line in modern biopolitical states between what is part of the population and what is not, and that this is, in a broad sense, racist.

8. Governmentality

After the publication of The Will to Knowledge, Foucault took a one-year hiatus from lecturing at the Collège de France. He returned in 1978 with a series of lectures that followed logically from his 1976 ones, but show a distinct shift in conceptual vocabulary. Talk of “biopolitics” is almost absent. A new concept, “governmentality,” takes its place. The lecture series of 1978 and 1979, Security, Territory, Population and The Birth of Biopolitics, center on this concept, despite the somewhat misleading title of the latter in this regard.

“Governmentality” is a portmanteau word, derived from the phrase “governmental rationality.” A governmentality is thus a logic by which a polity is governed. But this logic is for Foucault, in keeping with his genealogical perspective (which he still affirms), not merely ideal, but rather encompasses institutions, practices and ideas. More specifically, Foucault defines governmentality in Security, Territory, Population as allowing for a complex form of “power which has the population as its target, political economy as its major form of knowledge, and apparatuses of security as its essential technical instrument” (pp. 107–8). Confusingly, however, Foucault in the same breath also defines other senses in which he will use the term “governmentality.” He will use it not only to describe this recent logic of government, but as the longer tendency in Western history that has led to it, and the specific process in the early modern period by which modern governmentality was formed.

“Governmentality” is a slippery concept then. Still, it is an important one. Governmentality seems to be closely contemporaneous and functionally isomorphic with biopolitics, hence seems to replace it in Foucault’s thought. That said, unlike biopolitics, it never figures in a major publication of his – he only allowed one crucial lecture of Security, Territory, Population to be published under the title of “Governmentality,” in an Italian journal. It is via the English translation of this essay that this concept has become known in English, this one essay of Foucault’s in fact inspiring an entire school of sociological reflection.

What is the meaning of this fuzzy concept then? Foucault never repudiates biopower. During these lectures he on multiple occasions reaffirms his interest in biopower as an object of study, and does so as late as 1983, the year before he died. The meaning of governmentality as a concept is to situate biopower in a larger historical moment, one that stretches further back in history and encompasses more elements, in particular the discourses of economics and regulation of the economy.

Foucault details two main phases in the development of governmentality. The first is what he identifies as raison d’État, literally “reason of state.” This is the central object of study of Security, Territory, Population. It correlates the technology of discipline, as an attempt to regulate society to the fullest extent, with what was contemporaneously called “police.” This governmentality gave way by the eighteenth century to a new form of governmentality, what will become political liberalism, which reacts against the failures of governmental regulation with the idea that society should be left to regulate itself naturally, with the power of police applied only negatively in extremis. This for Foucault is broadly the governmentality that has lasted to this day, and is the object of study of The Birth of Biopolitics in its most recent form, what is called “neo-liberalism.” With this governmentality, we see freedom of the individual and regulation of the population subtly intertwined.

9. Ethics

The 1980s see a significant turn in Foucault’s work, both in terms of the discourses he attends to and the vocabulary he uses. Specifically, he focuses from now on mainly on Ancient texts from Greece and Rome, and prominently uses the concepts of “subjectivity” and “ethics.” None of these elements is entirely new to his work, but they assume novel prominence and combination at this point.

There is an article elsewhere in this encyclopedia about Foucault’s ethics. The question here is what the specifically political import of this ethics is. It is often assumed that the meaning of Foucault’s ethics is to retract his earlier political thought and thus to recant on that political project, retreating from political concerns towards a concern with individual action. There is a grain of truth to such allegations, but no more than a grain. While certainly Foucault’s move to the consideration of ethics is a move away from an explicitly political engagement, there is no recantation or contradiction of his previous positions, only the offering of an account of subjectivity and ethics that might enrich these.

Foucault’s turn towards subjectivity is similar to his earlier turn towards power: he seeks to add a dimension to the accounts and approach he has built up. As in the case of power, he does so not by helping himself to an available approach, but by producing a new one: Foucault’s own account of subjectivity is original and quite different to the extant accounts of subjectivity he rejected in his earlier work. Subjectivity for Foucault is a matter of people’s ability to shape their own conduct. In this way, his account relates to his previous work on government, with subjectivity a matter of the government of the self. It is thus closely linked to his political thought, as a question of the power that penetrates the interior of the person.

“Ethics” too is understood in this terms. Foucault does not produce an “ethics” in the sense that the word is conventionally used today to mean a normative morality, nor indeed does he produce a “political philosophy” in the sense that that phrase is conventionally used, which is to say a normative politics. “Ethics” for Foucault is rather understood etymologically by reference to Ancient Greek reflection on the ethike, which is to say, on character. Ancient Greek ethics was marked by what Foucault calls the “care of the self”: it is essentially a practice of fashioning the self. In such practices, Foucault sees a potential basis for resistance to power, though he is clear that no truly ethical practices exist today and it is by no means clear that they can be reestablished. Ethics has, on the contrary, been abnegated by Christianity with its mortificatory attitude to the self. This account of ethics can be found primarily in Foucault’s last three lecture series at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject, The Government of the Self and Others and The Courage of the Truth.

10. References and Further Reading

English translations of works by Foucault named above, in the order they were originally written.

a. Primary

    • Mental illness and psychology. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987.
    • The History of Madness. London: Routledge, 2006.
    • Birth of the Clinic. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • The Order of Things. London: Tavistock, 1970.
    • The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon, 1972.
    • "The order of discourse," in M. Shapiro, ed., Language and politics (Blackwell, 1984), pp. 108-138. Translated by Ian McLeod.
    • Psychiatric Power. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2006.
    • Discipline and Punish. London: Allen Lane, 1977.
    • Abnormal. London: Verso, 2003.
    • Society Must Be Defended. New York: Picador, 2003.
    • An Introduction. Vol. 1 of The History of Sexuality. New York: Pantheon, 1978. Reprinted as The Will to Knowledge, London: Penguin, 1998.
    • Security, Territory, Population. New York: Picador, 2009
    • The Birth of Biopolitics. New York: Picador, 2010
    • "Introduction" M. Foucault, ed., Herculine Barbin: being the recently discovered memoirs of a nineteenth-century French hermaphrodite Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980, pp. vii-xvii. Translated by Richard McDougall.
    • “The Subject and Power,” J. Faubion, ed., Power. New York: New Press, 2000, pp. 326-348.
    • The Hermeneutics of the Subject. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
    • The Government of the Self and Others. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2010.
    • The Courage of the Truth. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2011.

The shorter writings and interviews of Foucault are also of extraordinary interest, particularly to philosophers. In French, these have been published in an almost complete collection, Dits et écrits, by Gallimard, first in four volumes and more recently in a two-volume edition. In English, Foucault’s shorter works are spread across many overlapping anthologies, which even between them omit much that is important. The most important of these anthologies for Foucault’s political thought are:

  • J. Faubion, ed., Power Vol. 3, Essential Works. New York: New Press, 2000.
  • Colin Gordon, ed., Power/Knowledge. Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980.

b. Secondary

  • Graham Burchell, Colin Gordon and Peter Miller (eds.), The Foucault Effect. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1991.
    • An edited collection that is a mixture of primary and secondary sources. Both parts of the book have been extraordinarily influential. If constitutes a decent primer on governmentality.
  • Gilles Deleuze, Foucault. Trans. Seán Hand. London: Athlone, 1988.
    • The best book about Foucault’s work, from one who knew him. Though predictably idiosyncratic, it is still a pointedly political reading.
  • David Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: A Critical Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
    • An excellent selection of critical essays, mostly specifically political.
  • Mark G. E. Kelly, The Political Philosophy of Michel Foucault. New York: Routledge, 2009.
    • A comprehensive treatment of Foucault’s political thought from a specifically philosophical angle
  • John Rajchman, Michel Foucault: The Freedom of Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An idiosyncratic reading of Foucault that is particularly good at synthesising his entire career according to the political animus behind it.
  • Jon Simons, Foucault and the Political. London: Routledge, 1995.
    • The first work to focus on Foucault’s thought from a political introduction, this survey of his work serves well as a general introduction to the topic, though it necessarily lacks consideration of much that has appeared in English since its publication.
  • Barry Smart (ed.), Michel Foucault: Critical Assessments (multi-volume). London: Routledge, 1995.
    • Includes multiple sections on Foucault’s political thought.

Author Information

Mark Kelly
Middlesex University
United Kingdom



By its broadest definition, the term ‘Neo-Kantianism’ names any thinker after Kant who both engages substantively with the basic ramifications of his transcendental idealism and casts their own project at least roughly within his terminological framework. In this sense, thinkers as diverse as Schopenhauer, Mach, Husserl, Foucault, Strawson, Kuhn, Sellers, Nancy, Korsgaard, and Friedman could loosely be considered Neo-Kantian. More specifically, ‘Neo-Kantianism’ refers to two multifaceted and internally-differentiated trends of thinking in the late Nineteenth and early Twentieth-Centuries: the Marburg School and what is usually called either the Baden School or the Southwest School. The most prominent representatives of the former movement are Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, and Ernst Cassirer. Among the latter movement are Wilhelm Windelband and Heinrich Rickert. Several other noteworthy thinkers are associated with the movement as well.

Neo-Kantianism was the dominant philosophical movement in German universities from the 1870's until the First World War. Its popularity declined rapidly thereafter even though its influences can be found on both sides of the Continental/Analytic divide throughout the twentieth century. Sometimes unfairly cast as narrowly epistemological, Neo-Kantianism covered a broad range of themes, from logic to the philosophy of history, ethics, aesthetics, psychology, religion, and culture. Since then there has been a relatively small but philosophically serious effort to reinvigorate further historical study and programmatic advancement of this often neglected philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Proto Neo-Kantians
  2. Marburg
  3. Baden
  4. Associated Members
  5. Legacy
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Principle Works by Neo-Kantians and Associated Members
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Proto Neo-Kantians

During the first half of the Nineteenth-Century, Kant had become something of a relic. This is not to say that major thinkers were not strongly influenced by Kantian philosophy. Indeed there are clear traces in the literature of the Weimar Classicists, in the historiography of Bartold Georg Niebuhr (1776-1831) and Leopold von Ranke (1795-1886), in Wilhelm von Humboldt's philosophy of language (1767-1835), and in Johannes Peter Müller's (1801-1858) physiology. Figures like Schleiermacher (1768-1834), Immanuel Hermann Fichte (1796-1879), Friedrich Eduard Beneke (1798-1854), Christian Hermann Weiße (1801-1866), the Fries-influenced Jürgen Bona Meyer (1829-1897), the Frenchman Charles Renouvier (1815-1903), the evangelical theologian Albrecht Ritschl (1822-1889), and the great historian of philosophy Friedrich Ueberweg (1826-1871), made calls to heed Kant’s warning about transgressing the bounds of possible experience. However, there was neither a systematic nor programmatic school of Kantian thought in Germany for more than sixty years after Kant's death in 1804.

The first published use of the term 'Neo-Kantianer' appeared in 1862, in a polemical review of Eduard Zeller by the Hegelian Karl Ludwig Michelet. But it was Otto Liebmann’s (1840-1912) Kant und die Epigonen (1865) that most indelibly heralds the rise of a new movement. Here Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), Hegel (1770-1831), and Schelling (1775-1854), whose idealist followers held sway in German philosophy departments during the early decades of the 19th Century, are chided for taking over only Kant’s system-building, and for doing so only in a superficial way. They sought to create the world from scratch, as it were, by finding new, more-fundamental first principles upon which to create a stronghold of interlocking propositions, one following necessarily from its predecessor. Insofar as those principles were generated from reflection rather than experience, however, the ‘descendants’ would effectively embrace Kant’s idealism at the expense of his empirical realism. The steep decline of Hegelianism a generation later opened a vacuum which was to be filled by the counter-movement of scientific materialism, represented by figures like Karl Vogt (1817-1895), Heinrich Czolbe (1819-1873), and Ludwig Büchner (1824-1899). By reducing speculative philosophy to a system of naturalistic observation consistent with their realism, the materialists utilized a commonsense terminology that reopened philosophical inquiry for those uninitiated in idealist dialectics. Despite their successes in the realm of the natural sciences, the materialists were accused of avoiding serious philosophical problems rather than solving them. This was especially true about matters of consciousness and experience, which the materialists were inclined to treat unproblematically as ‘given’. Against the failings of both the idealists and the materialists, Liebmann could only repeatedly call, “Zurück zu Kant!”

The 1860’s were a sort of watershed for Neo-Kantianism, with a row of works emerging which sought to move past the idealism-materialism debate by returning to the fundamentals of the Kantian Transcendental Deduction. Eduard Zeller’s (1814-1908) Ueber Bedeutung und Aufgabe der Erkenntnishteorie (1862) placed a call similar to Liebmann’s to return to Kant, maintaining a transcendental realism in the spirit of a general epistemological critique of speculative philosophy. Kuno Fischer’s (1824-1907) Kants Leben und die Grundlagen seiner Lehre (1860), and the second volume of his Geschichte der neuern Philosophie (1860) manifested the same call, too, in what remain important commentaries on Kant’s philosophy. Fischer was at first not so concerned to advance a new philosophical system as to correctly understand the more intricate nuances of the true master. These works gained popular influence in part because of their major literary improvement upon the commentaries of Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757-1823), but in part also because of the controversy surrounding Fischer’s interpretation of Kant’s argument that space is a purely subjective facet of experience. Worried that the ideality of space led inexorably to skepticism, Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg (1802-1872) sought to retain the possibility that space was also empirically real, applicable to the things-in-themselves at least in principle. Fischer returned fire by claiming that treating space as a synthetic a posteriori would effectively annul the necessity of Newtonian science, something Fischer emphasized was at the very heart of the Kantian project. Their spirited quarrel, which enveloped a wide circumference of academics over a twenty-year span, climaxed with Trendelenburg’s highly personal Kuno Fischer und sein Kant (1869) and Fischer’s retaliatory Anti-Trendelenburg (1870). Although such personal diatribes attract popular attention, the genuine philosophical foundations of Neo-Kantianism were laid earlier.

Hermann Ludwig Ferdinand von Helmholtz (1821-94) outstripped even the scientific credentials of the materialists, combining his experimental research with a genuine philosophical sophistication and historical sensitivity. His advances in physiology, ophthalmology, audiology, electro- and thermo-dynamics duly earned him an honored place among the great German scientists. His Über die Erhaltung der Kraft (1847) ranks only behind The Origin of Species as the most influential scientific treatise of the Nineteenth-Century, even though its principle claim might have been an unattr­­­­ibuted adoption of the precedent theories by Julius Robert von Mayer (1814-1878) and James Joule (1818-1889). His major philosophical contribution was an attempt to ground Kant’s theoretical division between phenomena and noumena within empirically verifiable sense physiognomy. In place of the materialist’s faith in sense perception as a copy of reality and in advance of Kant’s general ignorance about the neurological conditions of experience, Helmholtz noted that when we see or hear something outside us there is a complicated process of neural stimulation. Experience is neither a direct projection of the perceived object onto our sense organs nor merely a conjunction of concept and sensuous intuition, but an unconscious process of symbolic inferences by which neural stimulations are made intelligible to the human mind.

The physical processes of the brain are a safer starting point, a scientifically-verifiable ground on which to explain the a priori necessity of experience, than Kant’s supra-naturalistic deduction of conceptual architectonics. Yet two key Kantian consequences are only strengthened thereby. First, experience is revealed to be nothing immediate, but a demonstrably discursive process wherein the material affect of the senses is transformed by subjective factors. Second, any inferences that can possibly be drawn about the world outside the subject must reckon with this subjective side, thereby reasserting the privileged position of epistemology above ontology. Helmholtz and the materialists both thought that Newtonian science was the best explanation of the world; but Helmholtz realized that science must take account of what Kant had claimed of it: science is the proscription of what can be demonstrated within the limits of possible experience rather than an articulation about objects in-themselves. Empirical physiognomy would more precisely proscribe those limits than purely conceptual transcendental philosophy.

Friedrich Albert Lange (1828-1875) was, at least in the Nineteenth-Century, more widely recognized as a theorist of pedagogy and advocate of Marxism in the Vereinstag deutscher Arbeitervereine than as a forerunner to Neo-Kantianism. But his influence on the Marburg school, though brief, was incisive. He took his professorship at Marburg in 1872, one year before Cohen completed his Habilitationschrift there. Lange worked with Cohen for only three years before his untimely death in 1875.

Much of Lange’s philosophy was conceived before his time in Marburg. As Privatdozent at Bonn, Lange attended Helmholtz’s lectures on the physiology of the senses, and later came to agree that the best way to move philosophy along was by combining the general Kantian insights with a more firmly founded neuro-physiology. In his masterpiece, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (1866), Lange argues that materialism is at once the best explanation of phenomena, yet quite naïve in its presumptive inference from experience to the world outside us. The argument is again taken from the progress of the physiological sciences, with Lange providing a number of experiments that reveal experience to be an aggregate construction of neural processes.

Where he progresses beyond Helmholtz is his recognition that the physiognomic processes themselves must, like every other object of experience, be understood as a product of a subject’s particular constitution. Even while denying the given-ness of sense data, Helmholtz had too often presumed to understand the processes of sensation on the basis of a non-problematic empirical realism. That is, even while Helmholtz viewed knowledge of empirical objects as an aggregate of sense physiognomy, he never sufficiently reflected on the conditions for the experience of that very sense physiognomy. So even while visual experience is regarded as derivative from the physiognomy of the eyes, optic nerves, and brain, how each of these function is considered unproblematically given to empirical experience. For Lange, we cannot so confidently infer that our experience of physiognomic processes corresponds to what is really the case outside our experience of them—that the eyes or ears actually do work as we observe them to—since the argument by which that conclusion is reached is itself physiological. Neither the senses, nor the brain, nor the empirically observable neural processes between them permit the inference that any of these is the causal grounds of our experience of them.

With such skepticism, Lange would naturally dispense, too, with attempts to ground ethical norms in either theological or rationalistic frameworks. Our normative prescriptions, however seemingly unshakeable by pure practical reason, are themselves operations of a brain, which develop contingently over great spans of evolutionary history. That brain itself is only another experienced representation, nothing which can be considered an immutable and necessary basis of which universal norms could be considered derivative. Lange thought this opened a space for creative narratives and even myths, able to inspire rather than regulate the ethical side of human behavior. Through their mutual philology teacher at Bonn, Friedrich Ritschl, Lange was also a decisive influence on the epistemology and moral-psychology of Friedrich Nietzsche.

The progenitors of Neo-Kantianism, represented principally by Liebmann, Fischer, Trendelenburg, Helmholtz, and Lange, evince a preference for Kant’s theoretical rather than ethical or aesthetical writings. While this tendency would be displaced by both the Marburg school’s social concerns and the Baden school’s concentration on the logic of values, the proto-Neo-Kantians had definite repercussions for later figures like Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933), the so-called empirio-positivists like Richard Avenarius and Ernst Mach, and the founder of the Vienna Circle, Moritz Schlick (1882-1936).

2. Marburg

Herman Cohen (1842-1918) was Lange’s friend and successor, and is usually considered the proper founder of Neo-Kantianism at Marburg. The son of a rabbi in Coswig, he was given a diverse schooling by the historian of Judaism Zacharias Frankel (1801-1875) and the philologist Jacob Bernays (1824-1881). Moving to Berlin, he studied philosophy under Trendelenburg, philology under August Boeckh (1785-1867), culture and linguistics with Heymann Steinthal (1823-1899), and physiology with Emil Du Bois-Reymond (1818-1896). One of his earliest papers, “Zur Controverse zwischen Trendelenburg und Kuno Fischer” (1871), was a sort of coming-out in academic society. Against Fischer, the attempt above all to understand the letter of Kant perfectly –even the problems that persisted in his work—was tantamount to historicizing what ought to be a living engagement with serious philosophical problems. Although roughly on the side of his teacher Trendelenburg, Cohen stood mostly on his own ground in denying that objectivity required any appeal to extra-mental objects. Granted a professorship at the University of Marburg in 1876, Cohen came to combine Kant-interpretation with Lange’s instinct to develop Kant’s thinking in light of contemporary developments: a “Verbindung der systematischen und historischen Aufgabe.” It was Cohen who published Lange’s Logische Studien (1877) posthumously and produced several new editions of his Geschichte des Materialismus. More interested in logic than science, however, Cohen took Lange’s initiatives in a decidedly epistemological direction.

Cohen’s early work consists mainly in critical engagements with Kant: Kants Theorie der Erfahrung (1871), Kants Begründung der Ethik (1877), and Kants Begründung der Aesthetik (1889). Where he progresses beyond Kant is most plainly in his attempt to overcome the Kantian dualism between intuition and discursive thinking. Cohen argues that formal a priori laws of the mind not only affect how we think about external objects, but actually constitute those objects for us. “Thinking produces that which is held to be” (Logik der reinen Erkenntnis [Berlin 1902], 67). That is, the laws of the mind not only provide the form but the content of experience, leaving Cohen with a more idealistic picture of experience than Kant’s empirical realism would have warranted. These laws lie beyond, as it were, both Kant’s conceptual categories as well as Helmholtz’s and Lange’s physiognomic processes, the latter of which Cohen considered unwarrantedly naturalistic. The transcendental conditions of experience lay in the most fundamental rules of mathematical thinking, such that metaphysics, properly understood, is the study of the laws that make possible mathematical, and by derivation, scientific thinking. While Cohen did not deny the importance of the categories of the understanding or of the necessity of sensuous processes within experience, his own advancement beyond these entailed that an object was experienced and only could be experienced in terms of the formal rules of mathematics. The nature of philosophical investigation becomes, in Cohen’s hands, neither a physiognomic investigation of the brain or senses as persistent ‘things’ nor a transcendental deduction of the concepts of the understanding and the necessary faculties of the mind, but an exposition of the a priori rules that alone make possible any and every judgment. The world itself is the measure of all possible experience.

The view had a radical implication for the notion of a Kantian self. Kant never much doubted that something persistent was the fundament on which judgment was constructed. He denied that this thing was understandable in the way either materialism or commonsense presumed, of course, but posited a transcendental unity of apperception as, at least, the logically-necessary ground for experience. Cohen replaces the ‘unity’ of a posited self, and indeed any ‘faculties’ of the mind, with a variety of ‘rules’, ‘methods’, and ‘procedures’. What we are is not a ‘thing’, but a series of logical acts. The importance of his view can be illustrated in terms of Cohen’s theoretical mathematics, especially his notions of continuity and the infinitesimally small. Neither of these is an object, obviously, in the views of materialists or empiricists. And even idealists were at pains to decipher how either could be represented. By treating both as rules for thinking rather than persistent things, Cohen was able to show their respective necessities in terms of what sorts of everyday experiences would be made impossible without them. Continuity becomes an indispensable rule for thinking about any objects in time, while the infinitesimally smallest thing becomes an indispensable rule for thinking about the composition of objects in space. Though a substantial departure from the Kantian ascription of faculties, Cohen never prided himself so much on ascertaining and propagating the conclusions of Kant as on applying Kant’s transcendental method to its sincerest conclusions.

Like his Marburg colleagues, Cohen is sometimes unfairly cast as an aloof logical hair-splitter. Quite the contrary, he was deeply engaged in ethics as well as in the social and cultural debates of his time. His approach to them is also based on a generally Kantian methodology, which he sometimes dubbed a ‘social idealism’. Dismissing the practical and applied aspects of Kant’s ethics as needlessly individualistic psychology, he stressed the importance of Kant’s project of grounding ethical laws in practical reason, therein presenting for the first time a transcendentally necessary ought. This necessity holds for humanity generally, insofar as humanity is considered generally and not in terms of the privileges or disadvantages of particular individuals. Virtues like truthfulness, honor, and justice, which relate to the concept of humanity, thus take priority over sympathy or empathy, which operate on particular individuals and their circumstances. Like both experience and ethical life, civil laws could only be justified insofar as they were necessary, in terms of their intersubjective determinability. Because class-strata effectually inculcate authoritative relationships of power, a democratic –or better— a socialist society that effaced autocratically decreed legal dicta would better fulfill Kant’s exhortation to treat people as ends rather than means, as both legislators and legislated at the same time. However, Cohen thought that then-contemporary socialist ideals put too much stock in the economic aspects of Marx’s theory, and in their place tried to instill a greater concentration on the spiritual and cultural side of human social life. Cohen’s grounding of socialism in a Kantian rather than Marxist framework thus circumvents some of its statist and materialist overtones, as Lange also tried to do in his 1865 Die Arbeiterfrage.

Hermann Cohen also remains important for his contributions to Jewish thought. In proportion to his decreasing patriotism in Germany, he became an increasingly unabashed stalwart of Judaism in his later writing, and indeed is still considered by many to be the greatest Jewish thinker of his century. After his retirement from Marburg in 1912, he taught at the Berlin Lehranstalt für die Wissenschaft des Judentums. His posthumous Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums (1919) maintains that the originally Jewish method of religious thinking –its monotheism— reveals it as a “religion of reason,” a systematic and methodological attempt to think through the mysteries of the natural world and to construct a universal system of morality ordered under a single universal divine figure. As such, religion is not simply an ornament to society or a mere expression of feelings, but an entirely intrinsic aspect of human culture. The grand summation of these various strands of his thought was to have been collated into a unified theory of culture, but only reached a planning stage before his death in 1918. Even had he completed it, Cohen’s fierce advocacy of socialism and fiercer defense of Judaism, especially in Germany, would have made an already adverse academic life increasingly difficult.

Cohen’s student Paul Natorp (1854-1924) was a trained philologist, a renowned interpreter of Plato and of Descartes, a composer, a mentor to Pasternak, Barth, and Cassirer, and an influence on the thought of Husserl, Heidegger, and Gadamer. Arriving at Marburg in 1881, much of Natorp’s career was concerned with widening the sphere of influence of Cohen’s interpretation of Kant and with tracing the historical roots of what he understood to be the essence of critical philosophy. For Natorp, too, the necessity of Neo-Kantian philosophizing lie in overcoming the speculations of the idealists and in joining philosophy again with natural science by means of limiting discourse to that which lay within the bounds of possible experience, in overcoming the Kantian dualism of intuition and discursive thinking.

However close their philosophies, Natorp stresses more indelibly the experiential side of thinking than did Cohen’s concentration on the logical features of thought. Natorp saw it as a positive advance on Kant to articulate the formal rules of scientific inquiry not as a set of axioms, but as an exposition of the rules—the methods for thinking scientifically—to the extreme that the importance of the conclusions reached by those rules becomes subsidiary to the rules themselves. Knowledge is an ‘Aufgabe’ or task, guided by logic, to make the undetermined increasingly more determined. Accordingly, the Kantian ‘thing-itself’ ceases to be an object that lies outside possible experience, but a sort of regulative ideal that of itself spurs the understanding to work towards its fulfillment. That endless call to new thinking along specifically ordered lines is just what Natorp means by scientific inquiry—a normative requirement to think further rather than a set of achieved conclusions. Thus, where Kant began with a transcendental logic in order to ground math and the natural sciences, Natorp began with the modes of thinking found already in the experimental processes of good science and the deductions of mathematics as evidence of what conditions are necessarily at play in thinking generally. The necessities of math and science do not rest, as they arguably do for Kant, upon the psychological idiosyncrasies of the rational mind, but are self-sufficient examples of what constitutes objective thinking. Thus philosophy itself, as Natorp conceived it, does not begin with the psychological functions of a rational subject and work towards its products. It begins with a critical observation of those objectively real formations—mathematical and scientific thinking—to ground how the mind itself must have worked in order to produce them.

One of the consequences of Natorp’s concentration on the continual process of methodological thinking was his acknowledgement that a proper exposition of its laws required an historical basis. Science, as the set of formal rules for thinking, begins to inquire by reflecting on why a thing is, not just that it is. Whenever that critical reflection on the methods of scientific thinking occurs, there ensues a sort of historical rebirth that generates a new cyclical age of scientific inquiry. This reflection, Natorp thought, involves rethinking how one considers that object: a genetic rather than static reflection on the changing conditions for the possibility of thinking along the lines of the continuing progress of science.

Plato’s notion of ideal forms marks the clearest occasion of –to borrow Kuhn’s designation for a similar notion—a paradigm shift. Under Natorp’s interpretation, Plato’s forms are construed not as real subsistent entities that lie beyond common human experience, but regulative hypotheses intended to guide thinking along systematic lines. No transcendent things per se, the forms are transcendental principles about the possibility of the human experience of objects. In this sense, Natorp presented Plato as a sort of Marburg Neo-Kantian avant le lettre, a view which garnered little popularity.

Like Cohen, Natorp also had significant cultural interests, and thought that the proper engagement with Kant’s thought had the potential to lead to a comprehensive philosophy of culture. Not as interested as Cohen in the philosophy of religion, it is above all in Natorp’s pedagogical writings that he espouses a social-democratic, anti-dogmatic ideal of education, the goal of which was not an orthodox body of knowledge but an attunement to the lines along which we think so as to reach knowledge. Education ought to be an awareness of the ‘Aufgabe’ of further determining the yet undetermined. Accordingly, the presentation of information in a lecture was thought to be intrinsically stilting, in comparison to the guided process of a quasi-Socratic method of question and answer. An educator of considerable skill, among his students were Karl Vorländer (1860-1928), Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950), José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955), and Boris Pasternak (1890-1960).

Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945) is usually considered the last principle figure of the Marburg school of Neo-Kantianism. Entering Marburg to study with Cohen himself in 1896, though he would never teach there, Cassirer adopted both the school’s historicist leanings and its emphasis on transcendental argumentation. Indeed, he stands as one of the last great comprehensive thinkers of the West, equal parts epistemologist, logician, philosopher of science, cultural theorist, and historian of thought. His final work, written after having immigrated to America in the wake of Nazi Germany, wove together Cohen’s defense of Judaism together with his own observations of the fascist employment of mythic symbolism to form a comprehensive critique of the Myth of the State (published posthumously in 1946). His wide interests were not accidental, but a direct consequence of his lifelong attempt to show the logical and creative aspects of human life –the Naturwissenschaften and Geisteswissenschaften— as integrally entwined within the characteristically human mode of mentality: the symbolic form.

Cassirer’s earlier historical works adopt the basic view of history promulgated by Natorp. The development of the history of ideas takes the form of naïve progresses interrupted by a series of fundamental reconsiderations of the epistemological methods that gave rise to those progresses, through Plato, Galileo, Spinoza, Leibniz, and Kant. Like Natorp, too, the progress of the history of ideas is, for Cassirer, the march of the problems and solutions constructed by the naturally progressive structure of the human mind. Despite this seemingly teleological framework, Cassirer’s histories of the Enlightenment, of Modernity, of Goethe, Rousseau, Descartes, and of epistemology are generally reliable, lucidly written expositions that aim to contextualize an author’s own thought rather than squeeze it into any particular historiographical framework. A sort of inverse of Hegel, for Cassirer the history of ideas is not reducible to an a priori necessary structure brought about by the nature of reason, but reliable evidence upon which to examine the progression of what problems arise for minds over time.

Cassirer’s historicism also led him to rethink Cohen’s notion of the subject. As Cohen thought the self was just a logical placeholder, the subject-term of the various rules of thinking, so Cassirer thought the self was a function that united the various symbolic capacities of the human mind. Yet, that set is not static. What the history of mathematics shows is not a timeless set of a priori rules that can in principle be deciphered within a philosophical logic, but a slow yet fluid shift over time. This is possible, Cassirer argued, because mathematical rules are tied neither to any experience of objects nor to any timeless notion of a context-less subject. Ways of thinking shift over time in response to wider environmental factors, and so do the mathematical and logical forms thereby. Einstein’s relativity theory, of which Cassirer was an important promulgator, underscores Cassirer’s insights especially in its assumption of non-Euclidean geometry. Put into the language of Cassirer’s mature thought, the logical model on which Einsteinian mathematics was based is itself an instantiation not of the single correct outlook on the world, but of a powerful new shift in the symbolic form of science. What Einstein accomplished was not just another theory in a world full of theories, but the remarkably concise formula for a modified way of thinking about the physical world.

The complete expression of Cassirer’s own philosophy is his three-volume Philosophie der symbolischen Formen (1923-9). In keeping with a general Kantianism, Cassirer argues that the world is not given as such in human experience, but mediated by subject-side factors. Cassirer thought that more complex structures constituted experience and the human necessity to think along certain pre-given lines. What Cassirer adds is a much greater historical sensitivity to earlier forms of human thinking as they were represented in myths and early religious expressions. The more complex and articulate forms of culture –the three major ones are language, myth, and science— are not a priori necessary across time or cultures, but are achieved by a sort of dialectical solution to problems arising when other cultural forms become unsustainable. Knowledge for Cassirer, unlike Natorp, is not so much the process of determination, but a web of psycho-linguistic relations. The human mind progresses over history through linguistic and cultural forms, from the affective expressions of primitives, to representational language, which situates objects in spatial and temporal relations, to the purely logical and mathematical forms of signification. The unique human achievement is the symbolic form, an energy of the intellect that binds a particular sensory signal to a meaningful general content. By means of symbols, humans not only navigate the world empirically and not only understand the world logically, but make the world meaningful to themselves culturally. This symbolic capacity is indeed what separates the human species from the animals. Accordingly, Cassirer saw himself as having synthesized the Neo-Kantian insights about subjectivity with the roughly Hegelian-themed phenomenology of conscious forms.

3. Baden

The intellectual pride of the Marburg school fostered a prickly relationship with their fellow neo-Kantians. The rivalry developed with the Baden Neo-Kantians (alternately named the “Southwest” school) was not so much a competition for the claim to doctrinal orthodoxy as much as what the proper aims and goals of Kant-studies should be. Although it is a generalization, where the Marburg Neo-Kantians sought clarity and methodological precision, the Baden school endeavored to explore wider applications of Kantian thought to contemporary cultural issues. Like their Marburg counterparts, they concerned themselves with offering a third, critical path between speculative idealism and materialism, but turned away from how science or mathematics were grounded in the logic of the mind toward an investigation of the human sciences and the transcendental conditions of values. While they paid greater attention to the spiritual and cultural side of human life than the Marburg school, they were less active in the practical currents of political activity.

Wilhelm Windelband (1848-1915), a student of Kuno Fischer and Hermann Lotze (1817-1881), set the tone of the school by claiming that to truly understand Kant was not a matter of philological interpretation–per Fischer—nor a return to Kant–per Liebmann—but of surpassing Kant along the very path he had blazed. Never an orthodox Kantian, he originally said "Kant verstehen, heißt über ihn hinausgehen." Part of that effort sprung from Kant’s distinction between different kinds of judgment as being appropriate to different forms of inquiry. Whereas the Marburg school’s conception of logic was steeped in Kant, Windleband found certain elements of Fichte, Hegel, and Lotze to be fruitful. Moreover, the Marburgers too-hastily applied theoretical judgment to all fields of intellectual investigation summarily, and thereby conflated the methods of natural science with proper thinking as such. This effectively relegated the so-called cultural sciences, like history, sociology, and the arts – Geisteswissenschaften – to a subsidiary intellectual rank behind logic, mathematics, and the natural science – Naturwissenschaften. Windelband thought, on the contrary, that these two areas of inquiry had a separate but equal status. To show that, Windelband needed to prove the methodological rigor of those Geisteswissenschaften, something which had been a stumbling block since the Enlightenment. In a distinctly Kantian vein, he was able to show that the conditions for the possibility of judging the content of any of the Geisteswissenschaften took the shape of idiographic descriptions, which focus on the particular, unique, and contingent. The natural sciences, on the other hand, are generalizing, law-positing, and nomothetic. Idiographic descriptions are intended to inform, nomothetic explanations to demonstrate. The idiographic deals in Gestaltungen, the nomothetic in Gesetze. Both are equally parts of the human endeavor.

The inclination to seek a more multifaceted conception of subjectivity was a hallmark of the Baden Neo-Kantians. The mind is not a purely mathematical or logical function designed to construct laws and apply them to the world of objects; it works in accordance with the environment in which it operates. What is constructed is done as a response to a need generated by that socio-cultural-historical background. This notion was a sort of leitmotif to Windelband’s own history of philosophy, which for the first time addressed philosophers organically in terms of the philosophical problems they faced and endeavored to solve rather than as either a straightforward chronology, a series of schools, or, certainly, a sort of Hegelian conception of a graduated dialectical unfolding of a single grand idea.

Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936) began his career with a concentration on epistemology. Alongside many Neo-Kantians, he denied the cogency of a thing itself, and thereby reduced an ontology of externalities to a study of the subjective contents of a common, universal mind. Having dissertated under Windelband in 1888 and succeeding him at Heidelberg in 1916, Rickert also came to reject the Marburger's assumption that the methodologies of natural science were the rules for thinking as such. Rickert argued instead that the mind engages the world along the dual lines of Geisteswissenschaften and Naturwissenschaften according to idiographic or nomothetic judgments respectively, the division which Rickert borrowed from his friend Windelband and elaborated upon (although it is sometimes attributed to Rickert or even Dilthey mistakenly). And similar to him as well, Rickert considered it a major project of philosophy to ground the former in a critical method, as a sort of transcendental science of culture. Where Rickert went his own way was in his critique of scientific explanations insofar as they rested on abstracted generalizations and in his privilege of historical descriptions on account of their attention to life’s genuine particularity and the often irrational character of historical change. Where Windelband saw equality-but-difference between the Geistes—and Naturwissenschaften, Rickert saw the latter as deficient insofar as it was incapable of addressing values.

History, for Rickert, was the exemplary case of a human science. Historians write about demonstrable facts in time and space, wherein the truth or falsity of a claim can be demonstrated with roughly the same precision as the natural sciences. The relational links between historical events – causes, influences, consequences – rely on mind-centered concepts rather than on observable features of a world outside the historian; though this of itself would not preclude the possibility of at least phenomenal explanations of history. More importantly, historians deal with events which cannot be isolated, repeated, or tested, particular individuals whose actions cannot be subsumed under generalizations, and with human values which resist positive nomothetic explanation. Those values constitute the essence of an historiographical account in a way entirely foreign to the physical sciences, whose objects of inquiry – atoms, gravitational forces, chemical bonds, etc.—remain value-neutral. A historian passes judgment about the successes and failures of policies, assigns titular appellations from Alexander the Great to Ivan the Terrible, decides who is king and who a tyrant, and regards eras as contributions or hindrances to human progress. The values of historians essentially comprise what story is told about the past, even if this sacrifices history’s status as an exact, demonstrable, or predictive science.

Rickert’s differentiation of the methods of history and science has been influential on post-modern continental theorists, in part through his friend and colleague, Karl Jaspers (1883-1969), and through his doctoral student, Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). The traditional scientific reliance on a correspondential theory of truth seemed woefully uncritical and thereby inadequate to the cultural sciences. The very form of reality should be understood as a product of a subject’s judgment. However, Rickert’s recognition of this subjective side did not entangle him in value relativism. Although the historian’s values, for example, do indeed inform the account, Rickert also thought that values were nothing exclusively personal. Values, in fact, express proximate universals across cultures and eras. Philosophy itself, as a critical inquiry into the values that inform judgment, reveals the endurance and trans-cultural nature of values in such a way that grounds the objectivity of an historical account in the objectivity of the values he or she holds. That truth is something that ‘ought to be sought’ is perhaps one such value. But Rickert has been criticized for believing that the values of historians on issues of personal ethics, the defensibility of wars, the treatment of women, or the social effects of religion were universally agreed upon.

4. Associated Members

Twentieth-century attempts to categorize thinkers historically into this or that school led to some debate about which figures were ‘really’ Neo-Kantian. But this overlooks the fact that even until the mid-1880’s the term ‘Neo-Kantian’ was rarely self-appellated. Unlike other more tightly-knit schools of thought, the nature of the Neo-Kantian movement allowed for a number of loosely-associated members, friends, and students, who were seekers of truth first and proponents of a doctrine second. Although each engaged the basic terminology and transcendental framework of either Kant or the Neo-Kantians, none did so wholesale or uncritically.

Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933) remains arguably the best scholar of Kant after Fischer and Cohen. And he probably maintained the closest ties with Neo-Kantianism without being assimilated into one or the other school. His massive commentary, begun in 1881 and left unfinished due to his health, exposited not only Kant’s work, but also the history of Neo-Kantian interpretation to that point. He founded the Kant-Studien in 1897, which is both the worldwide heart of Kant studies and the model for all author-based periodicals published in philosophy. Vaihinger’s own philosophy, which resonates in contemporary debates about fictionalism and anti-realism, takes as its starting point a curious blend of Kant, Lange, and Nietzsche in his Die Philosophie des Als-Ob (1911). For Vaihinger, the expressions that stem from our subjective makeup render moot the question whether they correspond to the real world. Not only do the concepts of math and logic have a subjective source, as per many of the Neo-Kantians, but the claims of religion, ethics, and even philosophy turn out to be subjectively-generated illusions that are found to be particularly satisfying to certain kinds of life, and thereafter propagated for the sake of more successfully navigating an unconceptualizable reality in-itself. Human psychology is structured to behave ‘as-if’ these concepts and mental projections corresponded to the way things really were, though in reality there is no way to prove whether they do. Freedom, a key notion for Vaihinger, is not merely one side of a misunderstanding between reason and the understanding, but a useful projection without which we could neither act nor live.

Wilhelm Dilthey (1833-1911) remains alongside Vaihinger as one of the great patrons of Kant scholarship for his work on the Academy Edition of Kant’s works, which began in 1900. Taught by both Fischer in Heidelberg and Trendelenburg in Berlin, Dilthey was strongly influenced by the hermeneutics of Schleiermacher as well, and entwines his Neo-Kantian denial of material realism with the hermeneutical impulse to see judgment as socio-culturally informed interpretation. Dilthey shares with the Baden school the distinction between nomothetic and idiographic sciences. Where he stresses the distinction, though, is slightly different. The natural sciences explain by way of causal relationships, whereas history makes understood by correctly associating particulars and wholes. In this way, the practice of history  itself allows us to better understand the Lebenzusammenhang –how all life’s aspects are interconnected—in a way the natural sciences, insofar as they treat the objects of their study as abstract generalizations, cannot. The natural sciences utilize an abstract Verstand; the cultural sciences use a more holistic way of understanding, a Verstehen.

Despite his shared interest in the conditions of experience, Dilthey is usually not considered a Neo-Kantian. Among several key differences, he rejects the Marburg proclivity to construct laws of thinking and experience that supposedly hold for all rational beings. Their consideration of the self as a set of logico-mathematical rules was an illegitimate abstraction from the really-lived, historically-contextualized human experience. In its place he stresses the ways historicity and social contexts shape the experiences and thinking processes of unique individuals. In distinction from the Baden school, Dilthey rejects Rickert’s theses about both the necessarily phenomenal and universal character of historical experience. Since we have unmediated access to our lived inner life through a sort of ‘reflexive awareness’, our explanations of historical events may indeed require a degree of generalization and abstraction; however, our sympathetic awareness of agent’s motivations and intentions remains direct. That inner world is not representational or inferential, but – contrary to the natural sciences – lived from within our inter-contextualized experience of the world. In this way, Dilthey alsocrossed the mainstay Neo-Kantian position on the role of psychology in the human sciences. It is not a field alongside sociology or economics that requires a transcendental grounding in order to gain a nomothetic status. Psychology is an immediate descriptive science that alone enables the other Geisteswissenschaften to be understood properly as a sort of mediation between the individual and their social milieu. Dilthey thought the results of psychology will, contra Windelband, allow us to move beyond a purely idiographic description of individuals to a law-like (though not strictly nomothetic) typology according to worldviews or ‘Weltanschauungen’.

Max Weber (1864-1920) was a student and friend of Rickert’s in Freiburg, and was also concerned with distinguishing the logic of historical judgment from that of the natural sciences. The past itself contains no intelligibility. Intelligibility is something added by means of the historian’s act of contextualizing an individual in his or her social environment. Unlike Comte (1798-1857), whatever ‘laws’ we might discover in history are really just constructions. And unlike Durkheim (1858-1917), talk of ‘societies’ runs the risk of hypostasizing what is actually a convenient symbol. Social history should instead be about trying to understand the motivations behind individual and particular changes.

The sociology of Georg Simmel (1858-1918) was also informed by a personal connection to Rickert. From its foundation by Comte and Mill (1806-1873), sociology had been marked by both a positivist theory of explanation-under-law and by an uncritical empiricism. Simmel, with the familiar Neo-Kantian move, undermined their naivety and replaced it with a more careful consideration of how society could be conceived at all. How do individuals relate to society, in what sense does society have a sort of psychology in its own right that generates changes and out of which spiritual shifts emerge, and how do the representational faculties affect societal rituals like money, fashion, and the construction of cities?

Taking history away from its sociological orientation and back to its conceptual roots was Emil Lask (1875-1915). Having dissertated on Fichte under Rickert in 1902 and habilitated on legal theory under Windelband in 1905, Lask was called to Heidelberg in 1910, where his inaugural lecture –“Hegel in seinem Verhältnis zur Weltanschauung der Aufklärung”— intimated a rather different line of influence. His work is comprised of two major published titles: Logik der Philosophie oder die Kategorienlehre (1911) and Lehre vom Urteil (1912). In them, Lask works out an immediate-intuitional theory of knowledge that went beyond the Kantian categories of the understanding of objects into the realm of a logic of values, and even probed the borders of the irrational. In fact he criticized the generalities of the Baden school’s Problemsgeschichte for lacking a concrete grounding in actual historical movements. Although Lask’s insistence to fight on the eastern front in the First World War cut short what should have been a promising career, he had significant influence on German philosophy through Weber, Lukács, and Heidegger. His death, in the same year as Windelband’s, stands as the usual endpoint of the Baden school of Neo-Kantianism.

The physiognomic leanings of the Neo-Kantian forerunners, like Helmholtz and Lange, were revitalized by a pair of philosophers of considerable scientific reputation. Richard Avenarius (1843-96) and Ernst Mach (1838-1916), founders of empirio-criticism, sought to overcome the idealism-materialism rift in German academic philosophy by closer investigation into the nature of experience. This entailed replacing traditional physics with a phenomenalistic conception of thermodynamics as the model of positivist science. In his Kritik der reinen Erfahrung (1888-90), Avenarius showed that the physiognomic factors of experience vary according to environmental conditions. As the nervous system develops regular patterns within a relatively constant environment, experience itself becomes regularized. That feeling of being accustomed to typical experiences, rather than logical deduction, is what counts as knowledge. Mach was similarly critical of realist assumptions about sensation and experience, positing instead the mind’s inherent ability to economize the welter of experience into abbreviated forms. Although the concepts we use, especially those in the natural sciences, are indispensable for communication and for navigating the world, they cannot demonstrate the substantial objects from which they are believed to be derived.

Alois Riehl (1844-1924) denied Liebmann’s claim that the Kantian thing-in-itself was nothing more than an incidental remnant of enlightenment rationalism. Were it, Riehl argued, Kantianism should give up any pretension to a positive engagement with science. Kant in fact never entirely rejected the possibility of apprehending the thing-in-itself, only the attempt to do so by way of the understanding and reason. It was not inconsistent with Kant to try to articulate noumena mediately, via indirect inferences from their perceptible characteristics in observation. Beyond its spatio-temporal and categorical qualifications, the particular characteristics of an object which we perceive and by which we distinguish it from any other object depend not on us so much, as upon its mode of appearance as it really is outside us.

Although Rudolph Otto (1869-1937) taught in Marburg, he had little interest in the logic of mathematics per se. Otto did, however, follow his school’s inclination to understand the objects of study in terms of the transcendental conditions of their experience as fundamental to the proper study, specifically of religion. What Otto discovered thereby was a new kind of experience –the ‘holy’— that was irreducible either to the categories of the understanding or to feeling. This had a substantial influence on the religious phenomenology of two other loosely-associated Neo-Kantian thinkers, Ernst Troeltsch (1865-1923) and Paul Tillich (1886-1965).

With certain Hegelian overtones, Bruno Bauch (1877-1942) was another fringe member of the Baden school with much to say about religion. While he studied with Fischer in Heidelberg, Rickert in Freiburg, and wrote his Habilitationschrift under Vaihinger in Berlin, he was more concerned than most Badeners with logic and mathematics, and in this respect represents a key link between the Neo-Kantians and both Frege, his confidant, and Carnap, his student. But his views about religion and contemporary politics kept Bauch at considerable distance from mainline Neo-Kantians. Due, in fact to his overt anti-Semitism, he was made to resign his editorship at the Kant-Studien. Having argued that Jews were intrinsically foreign to German culture, his embrace of Nazism during the very period of Cassirer’s emigration was an obvious affront, too, to the legacy of Cohen, whatever honors it may have gained him by the state-run academies.

Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950) began his career as a Neo-Kantian under Cohen and Natorp, but soon after developed his own form of realism. While remaining largely beholden to transcendental semantics, Hartmann rejected the basic Neo-Kantian position on the priority of epistemology to ontology. The first condition for thinking about objects is itself the existence of those objects. It was an error of idealism to assume the human mind constitutes the knowability of those objects and equally the error of materialism to assume that those objects are all open to knowability. To Hartmann, some objects were able to be known by way of their appropriate categorization. Others, however, must remain mysterious, closed off to human inquiry at least until philosophy could point the way toward new methods of comprehending them. Philosophy’s task, accordingly, was to discover the discontinuities between the ‘subjective categories’ of thought and the ‘objective categories’ of reality, and, where possible, to eventually overcome them.

Given the predominance of Neo-Kantianism in German academies during the turn of the century, a number of fringe-members deserve at least mention here. None can be considered an orthodox 'Marburg' or 'Southwestern' school Neo-Kantian, but each had certain affinities or at least critical engagements with the general movement. Friedrich Paulsen (1846-1908), Johannes Volkelt (1848-1930), Benno Erdmann (1851-1921), Rudolf Stammler (1856-1938), Karl Vorländer (1860-1928), the Harvard psychologist Hugo Münsterberg (1863-1916), Ernst Troeltsch (1865-1923), the plant physiologist Jonas Cohn (1869-1947), Albert Görland (1869-1952), Richard Hönigswald (1875-1947), Artur Buchenau (1879-1946), Eduard Spranger (1882-1963), and the neo-Friesian Leonard Nelson (1882-1927), who, though more critical than not about Neo-Kantian epistemology, shared certain ethical and social Neo-Kantian themes. There was also significant Neo-Kantian influence on French universities in the same years, with representative figures like Charles Renouview (1815-1903), Jules Lachelier (1832-1918), Émile Boutroux (1845-1921), Octave Hamelin (1856-1907), and Léon Brunschvicg (1869-1944). (For a more detailed look at French Neo-Kantians, see Luft and Capeillères 2010, pp. 70-80.)

5. Legacy

From March 17 to April 6, 1929, the city of Davos, Switzerland hosted an International University Course intended to bring together the continent’s best philosophers. The keynote lecturers and subsequent leaders of the famous disputation were the author of the recent Being and Time, Martin Heidegger, and the author of the recent Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, Ernst Cassirer. Heidegger’s contribution was his interpretation of Kant as chiefly concerned with trying to ground metaphysical speculation in what he calls the transcendental imagination through temporally-finite human reason. Cassirer countered by revealing Heidegger’s formulation of that imagination as unwarrantedly accepting of the non-rational. Agreeing that the progress of Kantian philosophy must acknowledge the finitude of human life, as Heidegger held, Cassirer emphasized that beyond this it must retain the spirit of critical inquiry, the openness to natural science, and the clarity of rational argumentation that marked Kant himself as a great philosopher and not only as an intuitive visionary. The Analytic philosopher Rudolf Carnap (1891-1970) was a participant in the Davos congress, and was thereafter prompted to write a highly critical review of Heidegger. What should have been an event that revitalized Neo-Kantianism in contemporary thought became instead the symbol both for the rise of the Analytic school of philosophy and for its cleavage from Continental thought. Increasingly, Cassirer was viewed as defending an unfashionable way of philosophizing, and after he emigrated from Germany in the wake of increasing anti-Jewish sentiment in 1933 the influence of Neo-Kantianism waned.

Even while serious Kant scholarship thrives in the Anglophone world of the early 21st century, Neo-Kantianism remains perhaps the single worst-neglected region of the historical study of ideas. This is unfortunate for Kant studies, since it inculcates an attitude of offhandedness toward nearly a century of superb scholarship on Kant, from Fischer to Cohen to Vaihinger to Cassirer. The Neo-Kantians were also the single most dominant group in German philosophy departments for half a century. Few works of Cohen, Natorp, Rickert, or Windelband have been translated in their entirety, to say nothing of the less prominent figures. Cassirer and Dilthey have attracted the interest of solid scholars, though it tends to be historical and hermeneutical rather than programmatic. Study of Simmel and Weber has been consistently strong, but more for their sociological conclusions than their philosophical starting points. To the rest, it has become customary to attribute a secondary philosophy rank behind the Idealists, Marxists, and Positivists –and even a tertiary one behind the Romantics, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, and Kierkegaard, none of whom, it may be reminded, held a professorship in the field. It is not uncommon even in lengthy histories of 19th Century philosophy to find their names omitted entirely.

The reasons for this neglect are complex and not entirely clear. The writing of the Marburg school is dense and academically forbidding, true, but that of Windelband, Cassirer, Vaihinger, and Simmel are quite eloquent. The personalities of Cohen and Rickert were eccentric to the point of unattractive, though Natorp and Cassirer were congenial. Their ad hominem criticisms of rival members seem crass, but such gossip is undeniably salacious as well. Some of their writing was intentionally set against the backdrop of obscure political developments, though often with other figures such obscurities give rise to cottage-industries of historical scholarship (see Willey, 1978). The two World Wars no doubt had a severely negative impact on the continuity of any movement or school, though phenomenology has fared far better. The fact that many of the Neo-Kantians were both social-liberals and Jewish virtually guaranteed their works would be repressed in Hitler’s Germany. Forced resignation and even exile was a reality for many Jewish academics; Cassirer even had his habilitation at Straßburg rejected explicitly on the grounds that he was Jewish. He and Brunschvicg both escaped likely persecution by giving up their homeland. But as the examples of Bauch and Fischer make clear, Neo-Kantianism need not be subsumed under a specifically Jewish or even minimally Semitically-tolerant worldview. And as Cohen’s resurgent legacy in Jewish scholarship proves, not all aspects that were once repressed need forever be.

To ignore the Neo-Kantians, however, creates the false impression of a philosophical black hole in the German academies between the decline of Hegelianism and the rise of phenomenology, a space more often devoted to anti-academic philosophers like Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Moreover, the Neo-Kantian influence on 20th century minds from Husserl and Heidegger to Frege and Carnap is pronounced, and should not be brushed aside lightly. In terms of early 21st century philosophy, Neo-Kantianism reminds us of the importance of reflecting on method and of philosophizing in conjunction with the best contemporary research in the natural sciences, something for which Helmholtz, Lange, and Cassirer stand as exemplars. And just as Liebmann’s motto ‘Back to Kant’ was exhorted to bridge the gap between idealism and materialism in the 19th century, so too may it be a sort of third way that rectifies the split between contemporary continental and analytic partisanship. If the old saying still carries water, then “one can philosophize with Kant, or against Kant; but one cannot philosophize without Kant.”

Fortunately there are signs of renewed interest. In 2010, Luft and Rudolf Makkreel edited Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press), which presents a well-rounded contemporary collection of research papers. In Continental Europe, no one has done more to revitalize Neo-Kantian studies than Helmut Holzhey and Fabien Capeillères, who have each published a row of books, editions, and papers on the theme. Under the directorship of Christian Krijnen and Kurt Walter Zeidler, the Desiderata der Neukantianismus-Forschung has hosted a number of congresses and meetings throughout Europe. A 2008 issue of the Philosophical Forum was dedicated to Neo-Kantianism generally, and featured articles by Rolf-Peter Horstmann, Paul Guyer, Michael Friedman, and Frederick Beiser among others. Studies of particular Neo-Kantians have been produced by Poma (1997), Krijnen (2001), Zijderveld (2006), Skildelsky (2008), and Munk (2010). And Charles Bambach (1995), Michael Friedmann (2000), Tom Rockmore (2000), and Peter Eli Gordon (2012) have composed fine works of intellectual history concerning the heritage of Neo-Kantianism in the twentieth century. 

6. References and Further Reading

a. Principle Works by Neo-Kantians and Associated Members

  • Helmholtz
  • Über die Erhaltung der Kraft (Berlin: G. Reimer, 1847).
  • Über das Sehen des Menschen (Leipzig: Leopold Voss, 1855).
  • Lange
  • Die Arbeiterfrage in ihrer Bedeutung für Gegenwart und Zukunft (Duisburg: W. Falk & Volmer, 1865).
  • Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1866).
  • Logische Studien: Ein Beitrag zur Neubegründung der formalen Logik und der Erkenntnisstheorie (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1877).
  • Cohen
  • “Zur Controverse zwischen Trendelenburg und Kuno Fischer,” Zeitschrift für Völkerpsychologie and Sprachewissenschaft 7 (1871): 249–296.
  • Kants Theorie der Erfahrung (Berlin: Dümmler, 1885 [1871]).
  • Die systematische Begriffe in Kants vorkritische Schriften nach ihrem Verhältniss zum kritischen Idealismus (Berlin: Dümmler, 1873).
  • “Friedrich Albert Lange,” Preußische Jahrbücher 37 [4] (1876): 353-381.
  • Kants Begründung der Ethik (Berlin: Dümmler, 1877).
  • Kants Begründung der Aesthetik (Berlin: Dümmler, 1889).
  • Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums (Leipzig: Fock, 1919).
  • Natorp
  • Forschungen zur Geschichte des Erkenntnisproblems im Altertum: Protagoras, Demokrit, Epikur und die Skepsis (Berlin: Darmstadt, 1884).
  • Platos Ideenlehre: Eine Einführung in den Idealismus (Leipzig: Dürr, 1903).
  • Philosophische Propädeutik (Marburg: Elwert, 1903).
  • Die logischen Grundlagen der exakten Wissenschaften (Leipzig: Teubner, 1910).
  • “Kant und die Marburger Schule,” Kant-Studien 17 (1912): 193-221.
  • Sozialidealismus: Neue Richtlinien sozialer Erziehung (Berlin: Julius Springer, 1920).
  • Cassirer
  • Zur Einsteinschen Relativitätstheorie: Erkenntnistheoretische Betrachtungen (Berlin: Bruno Cassirer, 1921).
  • Philosophie der symbolischen Formen, 3 vols. (Berlin: Bruno Cassirer, 1923-9).
  • Sprache und Mythos: Ein Beitrag zum Problem der Götternamen (Leipzig: Teubner, 1925).
  • Individuum und Kosmos in der Philosophie der Renaissance (Leipzig: Teubner, 1927).
  • Die Idee der republikanischen Verfassung (Hamburg: Friedrichsen, 1929).
  • An Essay on Man (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1944).
  • The Myth of the State (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1946).

  • Windelband
  • Die Geschichte der neueren Philosophie in ihrem Zusammenhange mit der allgemeinen Cultur und den besonderen Wissenschaften dargestellt, 2 vols. (Leipzig: Breitkopf & Härtel, 1878–80).
  • Praeludien: Aufsaetze und Reden zur Philosophie und ihrer Geschichte (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1884).
  • Einleitung in die Philosophie: Grundriß der philosophischen Wissenschaften, edited by Fritz Medicus (Tübingen: Mohr, 1914).
  • Rickert
  • Der Gegenstand der Erkenntnis: ein Beitrag zum Problem der philosophischen Transcendenz (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1892).
  • Die Grenzen der naturwissenschaftlichen Begriffsbildung, 2 vols. (Tübingen: Mohr, 1896-1902).
  • Kulturwissenschaft und Naturwissenschaft (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1899).
  • Die Heidelberger Tradition und Kants Kritizismus, 2 vols. (Berlin: Junker und Dünnhaupt, 1934).
  • Dilthey
  • Gesammelte Schriften, 26 vols. (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1914–2006).
  • Vaihinger
  • Hartman, Dühring und Lange: Zur Geschichte der deutschen Philosophie im XIX. Jahrhundert (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1876).
  • Kommentar zu Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft, 2 vols. (Stuttgart: Spemann & Union Deutsche Verlagsgesellschaft, 1881-92).
  • Die Philosophie des Als Ob (Berlin: Reuther und Reichard, 1911).
  • Weber
  • Gesammelte Aufsätze zur Soziologie und Sozialpolitik (Tübingen: Mohr, 1924).
  • Simmel
  • Über sociale Differenzierung (Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot, 1890).
  • Die Probleme der Geschichtphilosophie (Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot, 1892).
  • Grundfragen der Soziologie (Berlin: Göschen, 1917).

  • Mach
  • Die Analyse der Empfindungen und das Verhältnis des Physischen zum Psychischen (Jena: Gustav Fischer, 1886).
  • Bauch
  • Studien zur Philosophie der exakten Wissenschaften (Heidelberg: C. Winter, 1911).
  • Wahrheit, Wert und Wirklichkeit (Leipzig: F. Meiner, 1923).
  • Lask
  • Gesammelte Schriften, 3 vols., edited by Eugen Herrigel (Tübingen: Mohr, 1923-24).
  • Hartmann
  • Zur Grundlegung der Ontologie (Berlin: Walter De Gruyter, 1935).

b. Secondary Literature

  • Bambach, Charles R., Heidegger, Dilthey and the Crisis of Historicism (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995).
  • Beiser, Frederick C., The German Historicist Tradition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011).
  • Ermarth, M., Wilhelm Dilthey: The Critique of Historical Reason (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1978).
  • Friedman, Michael, A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, Heidegger (Chicago: Open Court, 2000). Dynamics of Reason: The 1999 Kant Lectures at Stanford University (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2001).
  • Glatz, Uwe B., Emil Lask (Würzburg: Königshausen und Neumann, 2001).
  • Gordon, Peter E., Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2012).
  • Hartmann, E. v., Neukantianismus, Schopenhauerianismus und Hegelianismus in ihrer Stellung zu den philosophischen Aufgaben der Gegenwart (Berlin: C. Duncker, 2nd expanded edition 1877).
  • Heidegger, Martin, “Davoser Disputation zwischen Ernst Cassirer und Martin Heidegger,” in his, Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik (Frankfurt a.M.: Vittorio Klosertmann, 4th expanded edition 1973), 246-68.
  • Holzhey, Helmut, Cohen und Natorp, 2 vols. (Basel/Stuttgart: Schwabe & Co., 1986).  Historical Dictionary of Kant and Kantianism (Lanham, MD: Scarecrow Press, 2005).
  • Köhnke, K. C., Entstehung und Aufstieg des Neukantianismus: Die deutsche Universitätsphilosophie zwischen Idealismus und Positivismus (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1986).
  • Krijnen, Christian, Nachmetaphysischer Sinn: Eine problemgeschichtliche und systematische Studie zu den Prinzipien der Wertphilosophie Heinrich Rickerts (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2001).
  • Krijnen, Christian & Heinz, Marion (eds.), Kant im Neukantianismus (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2007).
  • Külpe, Oswald, The Philosophy of the Present in Germany (New York: Macmillan, 1913).
  • Luft, Sebastian & Capeillères, Fabien, “Neo-Kantianism in Germany and France,” in The History of Continental Philosophy Volume 3: The New Century, edited by Keith Ansell-Pearson & Alan D. Schrift (Durham: Acumen, 2010), 47-85.
  • Makkreel, Rudolph, Dilthey: Philosopher of the Human Studies (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1993).
  • Makkreel, Rudolph & Luft, Sebastian (eds.), Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 2010).
  • Munk, Reinier (ed.), Hermann Cohen’s Criticial Idealism (Dordrecht: Springer, 2010).
  • Ollig, Hans-Ludwig, Der Neukantianismus (Stuttgart: Metzler, 1979). Materialien zur Neukantianismus-Diskussion (Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1987).
  • Poma, Andrea, The Critical Philosophy of Hermann Cohen (Albany: SUNY Press, 1997).
  • Rockmore, Tom (ed.), Heidegger, German Idealism & Neo-Kantianism (Amherst, NY: Humanity Books, 2000).
  • Schnädelbach, Herbert, Philosophy in Germany, 1831–1933 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984).
  • Sieg, Ulrich, Aufstieg und Niedergang des Marburger Neukantianismus: Die Geschichte einer philosophischen Schulgemeinschaft (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1994).
  • Skidelsky, Edward, Ernst Cassirer: The Last Philosopher of Culture (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2008).
  • Willey, Thomas E., Back to Kant: The Revival of Kantianism in German Social and Historical Thought, 1860-1914 (Detroit: Wayne State University Press, 1978).
  • Zijderveld, Anton C., Rickert's Relevance: The Ontological Nature and Epistemological Functions of Values (Leiden: Brill, 2006).


Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
Providence College
U. S. A.

Feng Youlan (Fung Yu-lan)

Feng Youlan (Fung Yu-lan, 1895-1990)

Feng Youlan (romanized as Fung Yu-lan) was a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Throughout his long and turbulent life, he consistently engaged the problem of reconciling traditional Chinese thought with the methods and concerns of modern Western philosophy. Raised by a modernist family who nonetheless gave him a traditional Confucian education, Feng pursued two great goals during his career: rewriting the history of Chinese philosophy from a modern perspective, and developing a reconstructed version of Chinese philosophy that could respond to the modern situation. The famous translator of Chinese philosophical texts, Wing-tsit Chan, summed up Feng’s contribution by saying: “At a time when Chinese intellectuals saw little value in the Chinese tradition, Professor Feng upheld it.”

Although Feng published his monumental and still-influential Zhongguo zhexue shi (History of Chinese Philosophy) in 1934, his effort to synthesize the traditional Neo-Confucianism of Cheng Hao, Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi with the philosophical traditions of the modern West that he studied with John Dewey took much longer to complete and arguably was never entirely successful. Between 1939 and 1947, during the early years of China’s occupation by Japan, Feng published Xin lixue (New Teaching of Principle), in which he presented Chinese philosophy, particularly Confucianism, as valuable for addressing both “the True Realm” (corresponding to the transcendent, metaphysical world of what Confucians call li – “principle” or cosmic norms – and ti, “substance”) and “the Real Realm” (corresponding to the immanent, physical world of qi, “energy” or material forms, and yong, “function”). Feng contrasted Daoist philosophy, which he labeled “the philosophy of subtraction” (that is, inward-looking and seeking unity with nature), and both Mohist and Western philosophy, which he described as “the philosophy of augmentation” (that is, outward-looking and seeking to master nature); with Confucian philosophy, which he saw as “the middle way” between so-called “other-worldly” and “this-worldly” philosophies.

Due to political upheaval in China following the defeat of Japan and the successful Communist revolution in the 1940s, Feng proved unable to continue this philosophical project and in many ways reversed direction. Telling Chinese Communist Party chairman Mao Zedong that he was “unwilling to be a remnant of a bygone age in a time of greatness,” Feng devoted himself to reinterpreting both his earlier work and Chinese philosophy in general through the lens of Marxist thought, which had become the orthodox ideology in mainland China under Mao’s rule, even going so far as to denounce Confucius during the final years of the Cultural Revolution (1966-1976). This effort provoked great controversy among his peers, many of whom had fled China to establish “New Confucian” enclaves within the universities of Hong Kong and Taiwan as well as in the West. Partly as a result of his controversial immersion in Maoist politics, Feng’s most enduring contribution to Chinese philosophy probably is his historical account of the subject rather than his own philosophical synthesis. Nonetheless, his work remains an interesting example of the way in which early 20th century Chinese thinkers attempted to develop a rational philosophical system that was credible to both Chinese and Western traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophical Works
    1. A Comparative Study of Life Ideals
    2. Six Books of Zhengyuan
  3. A History of Chinese Philosophy
  4. Influence
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Feng Youlan, whose zi (“style”) or courtesy name was Zhisheng, was born on December 4, 1895, in Tanghe County, Henan Province, to an affluent and prominent family.  Feng’s father completed the highest level of study required by the Qing dynasty imperial civil service and headed the local Confucian academy, but also maintained a personal library that included books about the West and modern affairs. From the age of six, Feng pursued a private education in the Confucian curriculum typical of the time, but had little interest in traditional rote learning. At the age of fifteen, he began studying in the county middle school and one year later transferred to high school, first in the provincial capital of Kaifeng, and then in neighboring Hubei Province. At the age of seventeen, he was admitted to the preparatory class of the Chinese Public University in Shanghai, where all courses were taught with English textbooks and the curriculum included Western logic and philosophy.

Feng studied philosophy at Peking (Beijing) University from 1915 to 1918, during which time he was exposed to various forms of foreign thought, ranging from the philosophy of Henri Bergson to the “New Realism” associated with British philosophers such as W. P. Montague. Also during this time, the New Cultural Movement, which questioned traditional Confucian values, was in full swing, provoking counter-reactions from conservative Confucian scholars. At Peking University, Feng met both Hu Shi (1891-1962), the iconoclast critic of Confucianism and Liang Shuming (1893-1988), the New Confucian apologist and social activist. In 1919, he traveled to the United States and, like Hu Shi before him, studied with John Dewey at Columbia University. He was deeply impressed by the United States’ advanced technology, emphasis on commerce, and atmosphere of law and order, which helped to confirm his sense that the Chinese psyche was inward-looking, contemplative, and holistic, while the Western spirit was outward-looking, analytical, and reductionistic. He was among the first to introduce Liang Shuming’s work to America.

In 1923, Feng completed his Ph.D. at Columbia, having entitled his dissertation A Comparison of Life Ideals. Looking back at this early work some sixty years later, Feng wrote:

I maintained that the difference between cultures is the difference between the East and the West. This was in fact the prevailing opinion at that time.  However, as I further studied the history of philosophy, I found this prevailing opinion to be incorrect. I discovered that what is considered to be the philosophy of the East has existed in the history of the philosophy of the West as well, and vice versa. I discovered that mankind has the same essential nature and the same problems of life... (Feng 2008: 658)

After completing his doctoral studies at Columbia, Feng returned to China and began his long teaching career there, having paid close attention to intellectual trends in China while he was abroad. Between 1923 and 1926, Feng held appointments in the philosophy departments of several Chinese universities, culminating in his being named Chair of the Philosophy Department and Dean of College of Humanities at Beijing’s prestigious Tsinghua (Qinghua) University in 1927.

In 1934, Feng had a fateful encounter with Communist ideology that would influence the future course of his life. While en route to a philosophical conference in Prague, he stopped to visit the Soviet Union, where he found a grand social experiment in progress.  Although he was not blind to the imperfections of Soviet Communism, he also was attracted to its utopian possibilities, as he later proclaimed in public speeches. As a result of his visit to the Soviet Union, he was detained briefly by Jiang Jieshi’s (Chiang Kai-shek’s) Nationalist government, but upon his release established a close relationship with the regime, which then ruled China despite the revolutionary activities of Communist factions. The outbreak of war between China and Japan in 1937 inspired Feng to work for the patriotic recognition and preservation of China’s unique philosophical heritage.  Between 1937 and 1946, he published a series of books to help justify Jiang Jieshi’s New Life Movement, which sought to safeguard the prosperity of the nation by instilling traditional values into Chinese citizens’ daily lives and transforming their moral character.

Due to political upheaval in China following the defeat of Japan in 1945 and the successful Communist revolution in 1949, Feng proved unable to continue this philosophical project and in many ways reversed direction. Telling Chinese Communist Party chairman Mao Zedong that he was “unwilling to be a remnant of a bygone age in a time of greatness,” Feng renounced his association with the Nationalist regime and devoted himself to reinterpreting both his earlier work and Chinese philosophy in general through the lens of Marxist thought, which had become the orthodox ideology in mainland China under Mao’s rule. This new work provoked great controversy among his peers, many of whom had fled China to establish “New Confucian” enclaves within the universities of Hong Kong and Taiwan as well as in the West.

Despite his apparent conversion to doctrinaire Marxism, Feng attempted to preserve a place for Confucianism under Mao’s aegis, asserting that this and other Chinese philosophical traditions, despite their reactionary historical baggage, could be “conceptually and abstractly” relevant in the Communist era. For example, Feng argued that the Confucian concept of ren or “benevolence” had in the past served the purpose of making the oppressed and exploited masses lose sight of intense class struggle and had sedated them into believing a dream of an impossible classless and harmonious society. Feng believed, however, that if taken “abstractly,” ren for all people could be a helpful idea even in Mao’s “New China.”

During China’s Cultural Revolution (1966-1976) Feng, along with many other academics, was denounced by Mao. Near the end of this period, however, Feng was able to regain a measure of public influence by allying himself with Mao’s wife, Jiang Qing, who enlisted his aid in her propaganda campaign against Confucius between 1973 and 1976. After Mao’s death and Jiang’s arrest and imprisonment, Feng’s political decisions cost him both his mianzi (“face” or public reputation) and, for a short time, his freedom.  By the 1980s, Feng was able to return to teaching and began work on a new manuscript entitled A New History of Chinese Philosophy, which was incomplete when he died in 1990.

2. Philosophical Works

a. A Comparative Study of Life Ideals

In 1923, Feng wrote his doctoral thesis A Comparative Study of Life Ideals. As the title of his thesis suggests, the relationship between Chinese and Western cultures was the focal point of his philosophical thinking. According to Feng, all forms of philosophy fall into three categories: “the philosophy of subtraction,” “the philosophy of augmentation,” and “the middle way.” Philosophers who value the natural world and distain human interference with nature wish to return to a state of innocence by reducing human artifice and interference. In this camp Feng placed Laozi and Zhuangzi, both of whom advocated “abandoning humanity and righteousness” and “eliminating sagehood and wisdom.” On the other hand, Feng saw both Western thought and Mozi’s philosophy as encouraging the conquest and transformation of nature and thus belonging to “the philosophy of augmentation.” Finally, Confucianism as Feng sees it insists on cultivating a balanced relationship between humans and nature and is therefore the middle way.

b. Six Books of Zhengyuan

The so-called Six Books of Zhengyuan include A New Philosophy of Principle, New Discourses on Events, New Social Admonitions, A New Inquiry into Man, A New Inquiry into the Tao, and A New Understanding of Language. Here, Feng’s approach was strongly constructive, as he intended to carry forward the Chinese philosophical tradition through these publications. Inspired by Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi, Feng called his philosophy the “New Philosophy of Principle” (Xin lixue).

In order to understand Feng’s reinterpretation of Neo-Confucian thought, it is necessary to examine the Neo-Confucian concepts of li (“principle” or “cosmic pattern”) and qi (“energy” or “material force”). Feng understood these paired concepts as representing the ontological relationship between the universal and the particular. The universal is eternal, abstract and intangible, yet it has a certain material basis in the concrete world or the world of “instruments,” as the Yijing (Book of Changes) describes it: “That which is above physical form is the Dao (“Way”); those things contained by physical form are instruments.” Objects in the concrete world that have physical form are not the proper objects of philosophical thinking. Rather, philosophy is concerned with knowing the universal through logical analysis. Feng distinguished between the metaphysical world of li (which he called “the True Realm”) and and ti (“substance”) and the physical world of qi (“the Real Realm”) and yong (“function”). The True Realm is like an arcane book, such that those with untrained eyes see only blank pages, but philosophical minds see meaningful words engraved on them. Between the two, the True Realm is “first,” not temporally but ontologically. That is, a given class of things in the Real Realm is an imperfect revelation of certain principle in the True Realm. Feng’s reimagined Confucian ethics, in shaping human society, is functionally derived from Principle of the True Realm.

Feng’s “New Philosophy of Principle” is realist in outlook – that is, it assumes that moral truths exist as facts, and thus that ethics and ontology are interrelated. As facts, moral truths really exist, and possess an inherent but abstract existence as “principle” (li). This “principle” manifests itself concretely as “material force” (qi) in the ever-flowing phenomenal world of the Way (Dao). Like Neo-Confucian thinkers long before him, Feng adapted Chinese Buddhism’s notion of “the emptiness of emptiness” to develop his notion of the Great Whole (daquan), or the totality of all that exists. Within the Great Whole, all things are one, and human beings find their purpose. The self-definition of human beings inevitably comes from their understanding of the universe.

All of this is very much in keeping with traditional Chinese thought’s concern for the harmonious relationship between Heaven, nature and human beings. Feng’s comparative studies of Plato and Zhu Xi, on the one hand, and of Immanuel Kant and the Daoists, on the other hand, represent a revamped lixue based on the fundamental outline of Zhu Xi’s highly influential philosophical synthesis, which (unlike the efforts of most of Feng’s fellow “New Confucians”), bid fair to become a major contribution to world philosophy.  Unfortunately, Feng proved unable to revise, refine, or elaborate upon this groundbreaking work of the 1930s.

3. A History of Chinese Philosophy

Feng began work on A History of Chinese Philosophy during the 1920s. Prior to its publication in 1934, the only available modern critical history of Chinese philosophy was Hu Shi’s Outlines of the History of Chinese Philosophy (1919), which was the first attempt to break away from traditional genres of writing about the history of Chinese philosophy. The latter are often based on unexamined genealogical traditions and historically unreliable materials. In addition, the traditional writings are typically in the form of commentaries and even random notes and reflections on classical texts, and lack a systematic approach. Hu attempted to address these two issues by offering critical scholarship analyzing and authenticating historical documents, on the one hand, and providing a survey of Chinese thought by means of employing Western philosophical concepts, on the other hand. The problem with Hu’s work was that he never finished it. Feng decided to follow in Hu’s footsteps and compose a comprehensive and critical historical account of Chinese philosophy, using the scholarly tools he had mastered at Columbia University. In contrast with Hu’s effort to dismantle and debunk Chinese traditions, however, Feng claimed that his approach more accurately and honestly interpreted the various schools and thinkers of Chinese philosophical traditions. Having based his own philosophy on Confucian concepts, Feng insisted on the central role of Confucianism in Chinese intellectual history.

Feng self-consciously adopted a modern approach to Chinese philosophy. He abandoned the traditional view that all historical Chinese thought was an imperfect interpretation of perfect truths revealed by ancient sages. However, unlike Hu Shi and other iconoclastic scholars of the time, Feng refused to see history as pious fabrications concocted by the political and religious powers of old. His method was to interpret and appreciate tradition as a valuable historical legacy. For instance, against traditional commentators, Feng insisted that the Laozi (also known as the Daodejing) was written at a time much later than the Spring and Autumn Period (770-481 B.C.E.)—a view since borne out by archaeological discoveries, although the date of the text remains a contested issue among scholars. But this does not make the Laozi a worthless forgery, as the iconoclasts contended. Feng was also extremely keen on creating a comprehensive understanding of the entire history of Chinese philosophy. Feng’s intention was to give his readers a sense of the direction and development in Chinese philosophy. He wanted to show that there were periods when Chinese thought was original and creative (such as in the era prior to the Qin dynasty’s establishment in 221 B.C.E.), followed by other periods when it became rigid and stagnant (as in the late feudal society of the 18th and 19th centuries). He also stressed that true philosophy came from observing nature and social life, not from lofty theories and hair-splitting textual analysis.

Many scholars see Feng’s historiographical contributions to Chinese philosophy as much more significant than his original constructive contributions as a Chinese philosopher.  Prior to the publication of A History of Chinese Philosophy, Chinese thinkers did not group their traditional schools of thought with “philosophy” as understood in the West.  It was not until the very late 19th century, in fact, that a word for “philosophy” appeared in East Asian languages. The Japanese thinker Nishi Amane (1829-1897) coined the term tetsugaku, “the study of wisdom,” to approximate the Western concept of “philosophy,” and this term was adopted for use in Chinese by the scholar-official Huang Zunxian (1848-1905) as zhexue, which typically was reserved for the description of Western thought, excluding traditional Chinese thought. Although this exclusive and Eurocentric view of philosophy still has its adherents, Feng’s achievement was in defining Chinese thought and Western thought in terms of the common category of zhexue or “philosophy.”

A History of Chinese Philosophy appeared in several different translations, first in Derk Bodde’s English edition and later in several other languages, including Japanese, French, Italian, Korean, and German. During Feng’s 1948 visit to the University of Pennsylvania, he gave lectures that later became the basis of the English-language book, A Short History of Chinese Philosophy (1948). In the 1980s, Feng began – but never completed – a revised, Marxist version of A History of Chinese Philosophy, which was to be called A New History of Chinese Philosophy.

4. Influence

Views of Feng’s philosophical legacy vary according to cultural context. In China, Feng is considered to be one of the few original philosophers that twentieth-century China produced. Not remembered for his classroom eloquence by his former students, Feng Youlan nevertheless was able to impart his scholarship on, and passion for, Chinese philosophy to generations of students, many of whom currently hold teaching positions in elite Chinese universities.

As a result of their renewed interest in twentieth-century “New Confucian” thinkers, contemporary Chinese scholars have devoted a considerable amount of scholarship to Feng’s “New Philosophy of Principle” (xin lixue), which they typically regard as a systematic and sophisticated endeavor. For many of his Chinese admirers, Feng’s works are evidence that ancient Chinese (especially Confucian) conceptions can be retooled and made useful for modern times. The influence of Feng’s thought is likely to become greater as Confucian traditions enjoy something of a revival across contemporary China.

In the West, on the other hand, Feng’s influence is limited mainly to the reception of A History of Chinese Philosophy, which has been translated into multiple Western languages. With the exception of a few somewhat obscure publications, there has not been substantial Western scholarly engagement of general philosophical interest with Feng’s works. Often recommended as an indispensable read for students of Chinese culture, history, and thought, A History of Chinese Philosophy also has received criticism for its apparent partiality to Confucianism over Buddhism and Daoism, China’s two other great spiritual and intellectual traditions. Although Feng considered himself to be a philosopher, his reputation outside of China is that of an historian, and the nature of Western academic interest in Feng has focused on him as an historical figure in his own right, who lived during a particularly critical and troubled moment in the development of modern China.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Chen, Derong. Metaphorical Metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy: Illustrated with Feng Youlan’s New Metaphysics. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2011.
  • Chen, Lai. Tradition and Modernity: A Humanist View. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2009.
  • Cheng, Chung-Ying, and Nicholas Bunnin, eds. Contemporary Chinese Philosophy. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 2002.
  • de Bary, William Theodore, and others, eds. Sources of Chinese Tradition. 2 vols. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999-2000.
  • Feng, Youlan. Selected Philosophical Writings of Feng Yu-lan. Beijing: Foreign Languages Press, 2008.
  • Feng, Youlan. The Hall of Three Pines: An Account of My Life. Trans. Denis C. Mair. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 1999.
  • Feng, Youlan. The Spirit of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Ernest Richard Hughes. Boston: Beacon Press, 1962.
  • Feng, Youlan. A History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1952-53.
  • Feng, Youlan. A Short History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. New York: Free Press, 1948.
  • Makeham, John. New Confucianism: A Critical Examination. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003.
  • Masson, Michel C. Philosophy and Tradition: The Interpretation of China’s Philosophic Past -- Fung Youlan, 1939-1949. Taipei: Ricci Institute, 1985.
  • Obenchain, Diane B., ed. Something Exists: Selected papers of the International Research Seminar on the Thought of Feng Youlan. Honolulu: Dialogue Publishing, 1994.
  • Teoh, Vivienne. The Post ’49 Critiques of Confucius in the PRC, with Special Emphasis on the Views of Feng Youlan and Yang Rongguo: A Case Study of the Relationship between Contemporary Political Values and the Re-evaluation of the History of Chinese Philosophy. Thesis (Ph.D.) -- University of New South Wales, 1982.
  • Wycoff, William Alfred. The New Rationalism of Fung Yu-Lan. Thesis (Ph. D.) --Columbia University, 1975.


Author Information

Xiaofei Tu
Appalachian State University
U. S. A.

Gadamer, Hans-Georg

Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900-2002)

GadamerHans-Georg Gadamer was a leading Continental philosopher of the twentieth century. His importance lies in his development of hermeneutic philosophy. Hermeneutics, “the art of interpretation,” originated in biblical and legal fields and was later extended to all texts. Martin Heidegger, Gadamer’s teacher, completed the universalizing of the scope of hermeneutics by extending it beyond texts to all forms of human understanding. Hence philosophical hermeneutics inquires into the meaning and significance of understanding for human existence in general.

Gadamer was influenced by Heidegger’s interest in the “question of Being,” which aimed to draw our attention to the ubiquitous and ineffable nature of Being that underlies human existence. “Being” refers to something like a “ground” (although not in the modern sense of “foundation”) or, better, background, that precedes, conditions, and makes possible the particular forms of human knowing as found in science and the social sciences. Gadamer developed Heidegger’s commitment to the ubiquitous and fundamental nature of Being in three related ways.

First, Gadamer wanted to elucidate the historical and linguistic situatedness of human knowing and to emphasize the necessity and productivity of tradition and language for human thought. For example, when Gadamer wrote that “Being that could be understood is language,” he meant that Being underlies, exceeds, and makes possible language.

Second, Gadamer sought to contend against the hubris of twentieth century positivism by demonstrating that truth is not reducible to a set of criteria, as is suggested by promoters of there being a scientific method. Just as Heidegger set out to uncover the way in which Being makes beings possible, so Gadamer aimed to demonstrate that truths derivable from method require a deeper, more extensive Truth. In order to extend truth’s domain beyond that of method (and note that Gadamer was never against method or science—only their totalizing tendencies), Gadamer explicates truth as an event. Truth is not, fundamentally, what can be affirmed relative to a set of criteria but an event or experience in which we find ourselves engaged and changed. These first two points form the emphasis of his magnum opus, Truth and Method (Wahrheit und Methode).

A third way of understanding Gadamer’s defense of the ubiquity of Being can be seen in the practical trajectory of Gadamer’s hermeneutics that arises from his interest in Plato and Aristotle. From Plato, Gadamer discerns the centrality of dialogue as the means by which we come to understanding. Dialogue is rooted in and committed to furthering our common bond with one another to the extent that it affirms the finite nature of our human knowing and invites us to remain open to one another. It is our openness to dialogue with others that Gadamer sees as the basis for a deeper solidarity. With Aristotle, Gadamer affirms the commitment that all philosophy starts from praxis (human practice) and that hermeneutics is essentially practical philosophy. We must not allow knowing to remain only on the conceptual (that is, distanced and theoretical) level; we must remember that knowing emerges from our practical quest for meaning and significance. Gadamer’s hermeneutics elucidates how Being makes human existence meaningful, where Being refers to commonality we all share.

Gadamer’s many essays and talks on ethics, art, poetry, science, medicine, and friendship, as well as references to his work by thinkers in these fields, attest to the ubiquity and practical relevance of hermeneutic thought today.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Early Years: Platonic Urges
    2. Middle Years: Under the Influence of Heidegger
    3. Later Years: Truth and Method and Beyond.
  2. Hermeneutic Inceptions
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
  3. “Foundations” of Philosophical Hermeneutics: Truth and Method
    1. Truth Beyond Science
    2. Prejudice, Tradition, Authority, Horizon
    3. Dialectic, Dialogue, Language
  4. Critical Encounters
    1. E.D. Hirsch
    2. Jürgen Habermas
    3. Jacques Derrida
  5. Practical Philosophy: Hermeneutics Beyond Gadamer
    1. Hermeneutics as Dialogue: Ethical and Political Interventions
    2. Twentieth Century Anglo-American Appropriations
    3. Applied Hermeneutics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Collected Works in German
    2. Main Books by Gadamer in English
    3. Selected Secondary Literature

1. Biography

a. Early Years: Platonic Urges

Hans-Georg Gadamer was born on February 11, 1900 in Marburg, Germany. Two years later his family moved to Breslau where his father took up the position of professor of pharmacological chemistry. The presence of his domineering, strict Prussian father devoted to natural science, and the absence of his deeply pietistic mother (who died in 1904 from diabetes) perhaps contributed to Gadamer’s interest in poetry and the arts. In his words, poetry and the arts were the closest things an “unredeemed agnostic” had to contend with the limits of human knowing (Gadamer: A Biography, 20-23).

In 1918 Gadamer began his studies at Breslau and then moved to the University of Marburg, where his father received a teaching position and later became rector. At Marburg, Gadamer first studied with Richard Hönigswald, who introduced him to neo-Kantianism, and then with Nicolai Hartmann, whose brand of phenomenology presented challenges to the neo-Kantianism of Hönigswald. Hartmann’s critique of neo-Kantianism proved a crucial impetus for Gadamer’s own thinking, including his subsequent turn away from neo-Kantianism. Yet Gadamer eventually came to question Hartmann’s rigid epistemology due to the fact that it remained committed both to Aristotelian realism and to an impoverished form of phenomenology, which failed to take seriously the importance of the knower’s perspective. Gadamer accused Hartmann’s phenomenology of not being radical enough since it ignored the more fundamental conditions of human knowing.

In 1922 Gadamer wrote his (unpublished) thesis with Paul Natorp on “The Nature of Pleasure according to Plato’s dialogues” (despite Natorp’s initial suggestion to write on Fichte). Natorp, himself a prominent Plato scholar and neo-Kantian at the time, took over in the wake of the declining influence of the neo-Kantians at Marburg. In Gadamer’s thesis we find the seeds of his later writings on Plato and Aristotle, gleaned from Natorp, that emphasized the unity of the one and the many, the forms, and the realm of sensuality. Gadamer was not only influenced by the mysticism of Natorp but also by the esotericism of the poet Stefan George, of whose circle he was a member. While a definitive causality is impossible to prove, one can detect connections between the recurrent challenge to scientism that pervades Gadamer's later, explicitly hermeneutic philosophy and the various “mysticisms” of Plato, Natorp, George, and Heidegger. What can be defended, however, is that what united the “mysticisms” of these thinkers, and thus inspired Gadamer, was their gesturing towards the realm beyond being that exposes the limitations of human understanding. While some used their “mysticism” to avoid the prosaic cares of daily life—cares that only blocked our access to this loftier, more radical and thus worthier realm—Gadamer rejected such an escapism and instead extolled “mysticism” for its propensity to insist on the finitude of human existence. True to his own unique interpretation of Plato that sought to refuse simplistic dualisms, Gadamer advocated acknowledging the beyond while at the same time insisting on our practical existence. In other words, human thinking always requires an acknowledgment of what cannot be fully captured in language, yet at the same time language, as that part of Being that can be understood, functions to create our human world and funds meaning. These themes of the productivity of the liminal or “horizonal”(for example, as developed by his notion “fusion of horizons”), and language’s in-between status, were born out of his early “Platonism” and served to undergird his later hermeneutic philosophy.

b. Middle Years: Under the Influence of Heidegger

Gadamer first encountered the written work of Heidegger in 1921 after reading one of Heidegger’s papers on Aristotle. Heidegger’s Aristotelian phenomenology, which refused the reductionism of Husserl’s phenomenology, provided Gadamer with the tools and impetus to deal the final blow to his earlier tendencies toward neo-Kantianism. During the summer of 1923 he pursued studies with Heidegger in Freiburg, where he also attended classes of Edmund Husserl, who although Heidegger’s teacher, stood in his shadow. When Heidegger was offered a position as chair at Marburg in October 1923, Gadamer followed him, a move that exacerbated the tension between Heidegger and Hartmann since many of Hartmann’s students ended up leaving him to study with Heidegger. Fellow students at Marburg during that period included Hannah Arendt, Hans Jonas, Jakob Klein, Karl Löwith, and Leo Strauss. Gadamer’s work with Heidegger was initially delayed due to Gadamer’s contraction of polio in 1922, which later served to exclude him from military service. It was during Gadamer’s convalescence that Hartmann worked to arrange a marriage for Gadamer to Frida Katz in 1923, with whom he had a daughter, Jutta, in 1926.

It should be noted that Gadamer’s relationship with Heidegger was an ambivalent one. Early on, Gadamer had thought he would write his Habilitation (doctoral dissertation) with Hartmann, but then he set his sights on Heidegger. However, Heidegger was initially unimpressed by Gadamer’s philosophical potential and encouraged him to pursue philology instead. Gadamer followed his advice and spent a number of years studying Plato with Paul Friedländer, from whom he learned about Plato’s dialogic and dialectic philosophy, an emphasis that would prove central to Gadamer’s later hermeneutics. In 1928, upon hearing of Gadamer’s plan to write his Habilitation with Friedländer, Heidegger reversed his earlier view of Gadamer’s incompetence as a philosopher and wrote a letter inviting Gadamer to work with him. In 1929 Gadamer took up a teaching position at Marburg and completed his Habilitation with Heidegger, published in 1931 as Plato’s Dialectical Ethics.

In 1933, while teaching courses on ethics and aesthetics at Marburg, Gadamer signed a declaration in support of Hitler and his National Socialist regime. Did this mean that like his teacher, Heidegger, he was an unabashed supporter of National Socialism? If so, as some suggest (Orozco), why would Gadamer have expressed shock months earlier when Heidegger had announced his own support for National Socialism? And why did Gadamer intentionally cultivate and maintain friendships with Jews during those years, while distancing himself from Heidegger until after the war? Gadamer’s biographer, Jean Grondin, offers details of Gadamer’s actions and inactions during this vexed period, and concludes that while Gadamer may have lacked the political savvy and courage for resistance, he was, unlike Heidegger, no Nazi. Reflecting back in later years Gadamer describes his shortsightedness: “it was a widespread conviction in intellectual circles that Hitler in coming to power would deconstruct the nonsense he had used to drum up the movement, and we counted the anti-Semitism as part of this nonsense. We were to learn differently” (Gadamer: A Biography, 75).

c. Later Years: Truth and Method and Beyond.

In 1939 Gadamer became a professor at Leipzig, where his first course was “Art and History,” which, as Grondin maintains, paved the way for his magnum opus, Truth and Method, published in 1960. In the same year, his first festschrift, which includes an essay by Heidegger, was also published. At Leipzig, Gadamer served as dean of the Philology and History Department and the Philosophy Faculty, as well as director of the Psychology Institute and in 1946 became rector. Unhappy due to political criticism launched at him, he sought a position in the west and initially taught at Frankfurt (1948) before accepting Karl Jasper’s offer to chair the philosophy department at Heidelberg (1949), where he taught until his official “retirement” in 1968. In 1950 he married again, this time to his former student and member of the resistance, Käte Lekebusch, with whom he had a daughter, Andrea, in 1956.

It was not until after his retirement that he gained status as an international thinker and a philosopher in his own right. This influence was due to several reasons. First, important debates with Jürgen Habermas and Jacques Derrida served to distinguish philosophical hermeneutics as a serious contender against both the critique of ideology and deconstruction. Second, he spent nearly twenty years teaching and lecturing in the United States each fall semester. Finally, Truth and Method was published in English in 1975. He continued to teach and lecture internationally and in Germany into his one-hundredth year. Gadamer died on March 13, 2002 in Heidelberg, while recovering from heart surgery. Today he is recognized as the preeminent voice for philosophical hermeneutics. Four claims focus the significance and originality of his hermeneutics: 1) hermeneutic philosophy is fundamentally practical philosophy, 2) truth is not reducible to scientific method, 3) all knowing is historically situated, and 4) all understanding reflects the ubiquity of language.

2. Hermeneutic Inceptions

a. Plato

Gadamer acknowledged that Plato, far more than Hegel or any other German thinker, motivated and inspired all his hermeneutics. Gadamer, though, remains no “traditional” Platonist, for, his early work on the Ancient Greeks is devoted to an attentive and nuanced re-reading of the significance of Plato for us today. What distinguishes Gadamer’s work on Plato is his desire to understand the questions and problems that motivated Plato. This approach stands opposed to attempts, common in Ancient Greek scholarship of the early twentieth century (for example, Leo Strauss and his followers), to uncover the “hidden doctrine” of Plato. In attempting to answer why Plato wrote his dialogues and what he was arguing against, Gadamer incites us not just to put questions to Plato—which can lead to an excessively distanced criticism of Plato—but to allow Plato to question us. The radical return to Plato made Gadamer all the more receptive to and excited by the thinking of Heidegger who also sought to understand Aristotle anew and in a more radical way.

As a result of his unique approach, Gadamer’s interpretation of Plato avoids the standard dualism (entrenched in part, Gadamer tells us, by Aristotle’s literalist readings of his teacher) that pits the Good-Beyond-Being against the good-for-us. Gadamer emphasizes the productive, rather than problematic, nature of the chorismos (the separation) between the sensual world of appearances and the transcendent realm of the forms. In other words, pace Aristotle, this separation was necessary and productive and not something to be overcome. Gadamer follows Plato in insisting on the ontological nature of the Good. Far from an empty concept, as Aristotle charged, the Good serves as an assumption that makes possible all understanding. The Good symbolizes the way in which thinking always “points beyond itself” (Philosophical Apprenticeships, 186). The plethora and variety of appearances must be made sense of in light of the assumption that something lies beyond our present understanding—namely, the Idea of the Good. Plato appealed to the Good in order to criticize the ethical relativism of the Eleatics. Gadamer draws our attention to how Plato’s appeal to the Good allowed him to transform Eleatic dialectic in two important ways: 1) to direct it towards getting clear about the “subject matter” (die Sache) as opposed to having as its goal the defeat of one’s opponent with logical prowess, and 2) to ground it in Socratic dialogue. Gadamer himself sought to recover the emphasis on the early Platonic dialectic, while refusing its later Hegelian instantiation, in order to return philosophy to Plato’s original intention as a dialectic defined primarily as the “art of carrying on a conversation” (Philosophical Apprenticeships, 186). The key to Gadamer’s later hermeneutics is grasping the significance of how Gadamer understands the connection between Platonic dialectic and Socratic dialogue.

b. Aristotle

Gadamer also returns anew to Aristotle. By stressing the import of Aristotle’s practical philosophy as that which emphasizes the background, that is, the conditions, for knowing, Gadamer challenged one of the leading Aristotelians of his day, Werner Jaeger. All knowing always starts from practical human concerns and must not lose its way in abstraction (a charge Gadamer later made against the Critique of Ideology). Gadamer’s interest in practical philosophy and its basis in human experience motivated hermeneutics’ ethical sensibilities, for instance, as witnessed in Gadamer’s esteem of phronesis as a key hermeneutic principle. What Gadamer wants to draw out from phronesis is the way in which knowledge is for the sake of acting, in other words, for the sake of living. An excessively theoretical or scientific knowledge forgets that knowledge stems out of and must return to praxis. But what sort of knowledge is sufficient for action conditioned by the variability of human life? The knowledge appropriate for the task is what Aristotle names as “phronesis.” Such a knowledge requires application but not in the way that modern science understands application: namely, the secondary and discrete step that follows from a prior theoretical knowledge. Neither is it adequately expressed by “judgment” (as in its later Kantian instanciation that subsumes a particular under a universal.) that subsumes a particular under a universal. Phronesis rejects the theory-practice dualism of both of these models of knowledge and instead entails the ability to transform a prior communal knowledge, that is, sensus communis, into a know-how relevant for a new situation. It is this requirement for human judgment emerging forth from a specific human community that Gadamer describes as reflective of hermeneutic understanding. The ethical overtone of phronesis as a hermeneutic concept suggests the way in which this knowledge is directed toward right action based on a “universal” (that is, communal rather than transcendent) knowledge. As Gadamer explains in Truth and Method, while “hermeneutical consciousness is involved neither with technical nor moral knowledge” (315) there is an overlap with the latter to the extent to which it entails right action based primarily on the ability to make one’s own that which comes to one out of a community. Such knowledge emerges out from and returns to praxis. Accordingly, one of Gadamer’s key contributions to philosophy, and one that took him beyond his teacher, Heidegger, was to insist that hermeneutics is practical philosophy. Gadamer clarifies that practical philosophy is rooted in human existence, which is never solipsistic but always communal. Rejecting the absolutism of modernity, Gadamer’s philosophy emphasized experience, but not the isolated existence of much 19th and 20th century existentialism. Rather, for Gadamer, existence means existing with others, which requires dialogue born of humility and an openness for inquiry: “hermeneutic philosophy understands itself not as an absolute position but as a way of experience. It insists that there is no higher principle than holding oneself open in a conversation” (Philosophical Hermeneutics, 189).

3. “Foundations” of Philosophical Hermeneutics: Truth and Method

a. Truth Beyond Science

Heidegger referred to his own early work as “hermeneutical philosophy,” and after his “turn” quipped that he wanted to leave the business of hermeneutics to Gadamer. Gadamer himself was never sure whether this was a compliment or a criticism! Nonetheless, Gadamer did develop hermeneutics beyond Heidegger’s use of that term, which can be seen foremost in Gadamer’s unique concept of truth, as developed most fully in Truth and Method.

Originally titled by Gadamer as Foundations of a Philosophical Hermeneutics, Truth and Method is just that. Following Heidegger’s initiative to increase the scope of hermeneutics beyond that of texts, Gadamer endorses the insight that humans are fundamentally beings who are given to understanding. Our task, if we are to truly know ourselves, is to figure out what such understanding entails, taking into account both its possibilities and limitations. Gadamer, however, goes further than Heidegger and asks if this is the case, what specifically does this mean for the humanities (Geisteswissenschaften)? Gadamer’s answer has both negative and positive components. Negatively, Truth and Method is critical of not only the methodologism and scientism underlying the hermeneutics of Dilthey and the phenomenology of Husserl, but also the twentieth century proclivity for positivism and/or naturalism. Yet in his move to put science “in its place,” so to speak, one finds a positive attempt to reinvigorate our appreciation of art, showing not only how it speaks truth but also how it serves as the paragon of truth. He argues not only that meaningful knowledge sought by the humanities is irreducible to that of the natural sciences, but that there is deeper, richer truth that exceeds scientific method. However, this commitment does not mean, as Jürgen Habermas and Paul Ricoeur maintained, that Gadamer opposes truth to method. For such a conclusion misses the crucial point that for Gadamer all forms of methodological truth are dependent on this deeper sense of hermeneutic truth. What sort of truth is it that underlies yet is not limited to natural scientific truth?

Over and against traditional conceptions of truth, Gadamer argues that truth is fundamentally an event, a happening, in which one encounters something that is larger than and beyond oneself. Truth is not the result of the application of a set of criteria requiring the subject’s distanced judgment of adequacy or inadequacy.  Truth exceeds the criteria-based judgment of the individual (although we could say it makes possible such a judgment). Gadamer explains in the last lines of Truth and Method that “In understanding we are drawn into an event of truth and arrive, as it were, too late, if we want to know what we are supposed to believe” (490). Truth is not, fundamentally, the result of an objective epistemic relation to the world (as put forth by correspondence or coherence theories of truth). An objective model of truth assumes that we can set ourselves at a distant from and thus make a judgment about truth using a set of criteria that is fully discernible, separable, and manipulable by us. Gadamer’s point is that there is a more fundamental happening of truth that is irreducible to such methodological applications, which perhaps we could call verisimilitudinous in regards to the deeper, hermeneutic, sense. Gadamer aims not to negate scientific method but to elucidate 1) what makes it possible and 2) the limitations of its scope. Gadamer is interested in dispelling the hubris of science (that is, scientism born of positivism) and not denigrating the practice of science per se. Furthermore, Gadamer took pains to clarify in his foreword to the second edition of Truth and Method that he is not offering a new method for hermeneutics or the social sciences. His work is not prescriptive. But neither is it descriptive of human behavior. He tells us: “My real concern was and is philosophic: not what we do or what we ought to do, but what happens to us over and above our wanting and doing” (xxviii). This statement also reveals the influence that Heidegger’s retrieval of the question of Being had on Gadamer’s thought in general, and his account of truth in particular. Gadamer’s critique of a scientific or modern theory of truth was, like much of Heidegger’s thought, a critique of subjectivism. Specifically, Gadamer maintained that the knower is never able to fully conceptualize and judge his or her own belief structure. Yet Gadamer’s account of truth went further than Heidegger’s and entailed a second claim, namely, that truth is fundamentally practical. Let us take a closer look at each of these two claims.

Regarding his anti-subjectivism, Gadamer describes the event of truth as an experience in which one is drawn away from oneself into something beyond oneself. To experience truth requires losing oneself in something greater and more extensive than oneself. The paradigmatic example of such an anti-subjective experience is play, to which Gadamer devotes quite a bit of space in Truth and Method. In order to appreciate the anti-subjective emphasis of play, it is helpful to understand its “medial” (Truth and Method, 103, 105) nature: players do not direct or control the play but are caught up in it. Play has “primacy over the consciousness of the player” (104), follows its own course, and plays itself, so to speak. Play is not played by a subject but rather absorbs the player into itself. Gadamer’s primary concern is to elucidate what it means to be caught up in the game in a way that diminishes the subjectivity of the player. In fact, the subject of the game is not the player but the game itself. However, this emphasis does not mean that the player relinquishes all power or consciousness and dons a zombie-like state—in which case there would be no mediality. Rather, Gadamer’s point is that play is effortless, without strain, and spontaneous (105), always enticing one into more play. The fact that in play one experiences oneself as in-between oneself and the play, that is, one neither exerts full control nor is passively swept along, reflects its mediality.

The constant back-and-forth movement of play eludes the grasp and guidance of an agent’s will, and yet, at the same time, is seemingly full of initiative. Play succeeds when the player engages in it with ease and where the player is never awkward or removed. But neither is the play excessively competitive. Gadamer’s insistence on the “contested” nature of such movement emphasizes the fact that one always plays with something or someone else. By “contest” Gadamer means to suggest only that play is never the act of a lone individual—not that it is necessarily agonistic. The negative component of competition that some (Lugones) read into Gadamer is difficult to defend given Gadamer’s insistence that the goal of play is not to end the game by winning but to keep on playing. While there is an initial assertive and intentional choice of entering into a game, once the game has gotten underway, being caught up in the game replaces any prior intentionality. To play, as Gadamer suggests, is to choose to give up our choice. In play, one substitutes one’s “free, individual choice,” so to speak, for the experience of a new sort of freedom which entails losing oneself in reciprocal play with someone or something else. The alleged “freedom” to remain isolated, in control, and able to choose is replaced by the freedom found in relinquishing oneself to the play of the game.

In addition to its medial nature, Gadamer highlights a second feature of play, namely “presentation,” which is what ultimately allows Gadamer to explain how play becomes transformed into art. Gadamer insists that human play is always marked by self-presentation: in play we present ourselves as something/someone else. While there is self-presentation in nature, according to Gadamer, human play-as-self-presentation is different:

The self-presentation of human play depends on the player’s conduct being tied to the make-believe goals of the game, but the “meaning” of these does not in fact depend on their being achieved. Rather, in spending oneself on the task of the game, one is in fact playing oneself out. The self-presentation of the game involves the player’s achieving, as it were, his own self-presentation by playing—that is, presenting—something. Only because play is always presentation is human play able to make representation itself the task of the game. (Truth and Method, 108)

What Gadamer is getting at here is that the purpose of play is not a presentation of a final, completed product for a third-party observer. Rather, he clarifies how in play our only goal is to figure out how to represent ourselves so that the game continues, thus recalling the contestial nature of play that requires two and aspires to keep playing. In other words, in true play the goal is not to achieve the prize but to present oneself as something in such a way that furthers the play.

Gadamer describes how play becomes “art” when the presentation is aimed at the absence of the “fourth wall”—that is, the viewer. Whereas in games the presentation is self-contained, in art, play-as-presentation does aim at something beyond itself. The playful self-presentation characterizing mediality gets transformed into pure presentation in art, signifying a potential for truth not found in the anti-subjective dimension of play. However, Gadamer warns, “when we speak of play in reference to the experience of art, this means neither the orientation nor even the state of mind of the creator or of those enjoying the work of art, nor the freedom of subjectivity engaged in play, but the mode of being of the work of art itself” (Truth and Method, 101). To grasp exactly what Gadamer means by “the mode of being of the work of art itself” we can now attend to the second claim Gadamer raises about truth, namely, its practical importance. Art exemplifies how truth is a matter of being spoken to, being claimed, and being changed. The truth emerging from art is an existential, practical one, rather than a purely theoretical one.

For Gadamer, truth is inextricably tied to our ability to recognize “something and oneself” (Truth and Method, 114). Unlike previous theories, however, that tied recognition to the ability to recognize the original presented by art, Gadamer emphasizes the future, rather than the past, as defining recognition. Recognition aimed at the truth of art stems not from its ability to mimic (or correspond to) an original but from its ability to bring to presence that which is truer than the original. To encounter the truth in art is not to look back to an original; art serves not as the mirror to the world-that-is-really-there, but as a means to opening one’s eyes to new ways of seeing and future possibilities. It is new visions not past ones that can count as true, and for this reason Gadamer insists that what is presented in art is actually more true than the alleged original it purports to imitate. But what does this mean and how does it reflect truth’s practical bent? Recognition thus requires more than objective seeing where one brackets one’s subjectivity and remains at an existential distance from the art. Recognition means being played by, drawn into, the work of art in such a way that one’s own being is altered. As Gadamer puts it, our encounter with art that produces truth occurs when we hear the art speaking as if directly to us: “it is not only the ‘This art thou!’ disclosed in a joyous and frightening shock; it also says to us; ‘Thou must alter thy life!’” (Philosophical Hermeneutics, 104). The neutral gaze of aesthetic consciousness affords no truth, for nothing is at stake, nothing is disturbed, and everything is left as it was before. For Gadamer, the truth of art refers to its practical ability to speak to, that is, change, the viewer. Art’s “mode,” then, is “presentation” (Truth and Method, 115) to the extent to which it presents an “essential” truth, where “essence” refers not to a stable, a priori, but to the relation established by our encounter with the art. To lose oneself in the play of art that then leads to a finding and a recognition of oneself—one that activates an envisioning of oneself in the future and not the past—is to experience truth. Gadamer writes, “In being played the play speaks to the spectator through its presentation; and it does so in such a way that, despite the distance between [the play and the spectator], the spectator still belongs to play” (116). The belongingness is not one that suggests a “deep, hidden truth,” as Dreyfus and Rabinow maintain, but rather one in which we experience ourselves made present with the art—which is possible only as we look ahead, envisioning ourselves anew.

To maintain the evential character of truth is to expose the dynamic nature of understanding, specifically in terms of a “double movement” (Barthold). Gadamer’s account of truth requires not only that one be drawn away from oneself and caught up in something larger than oneself, one must also “return to oneself.” Here, the “return to self” means the ability to grasp the meaning for oneself in a way that changes one. As we have seen, Gadamer does not just offer a critique of modern subjectivism, he also argues for the practical moment in which one feels compelled to change one’s life. The anti-subjective implication of Gadamer’s account of truth, to the extent it is a move away from oneself, is suggestive of the Platonic motion of ascendance. And the subsequent impetus for practical application, the return to oneself, reflects the descendance also reminiscent of Plato. If we do not engage in such a dynamic experience, one both in which one is caught up and from which one emerges changed, then one has not experienced truth. This hermeneutic account of truth refrains from explicating the method or the criteria required to arrive at a correct judgment. Instead it attempts to elucidate the more primordial sense of truth that underlies, but does not oppose, traditional accounts of truth like the correspondence and coherence theories.

b. Prejudice, Tradition, Authority, Horizon

In part II of Truth and Method Gadamer develops four key concepts central to his hermeneutics: prejudice, tradition, authority, and horizon. Prejudice (Vorurteil) literally means a fore-judgment, indicating all the assumptions required to make a claim of knowledge. Behind every claim and belief lie many other tacit beliefs;  it is the work of understanding to expose and subsequently affirm or negate them. Unlike our everyday use of the word, which always implies that which is damning and unfounded, Gadamer’s use of  “prejudice” is neutral: we do not know in advance which prejudices are worth preserving and which should be rejected. Furthermore, prejudice-free knowledge is neither desirable nor possible. Neither the hermeneutic circle nor prejudices are necessarily vicious. Against the enlightenment’s “prejudice against prejudice” (272) Gadamer argues that prejudices are the very source of our knowledge. To dream with Descartes of razing to the ground all beliefs that are not clear and distinct is a move of deception that would entail ridding oneself of the very language that allows one to formulate doubt in the first place. To further understand the vital role of prejudices, we must examine the role Gadamer assigns to tradition.

“Tradition,” like “prejudice,” is a term Gadamer develops beyond its everyday meaning. To affirm, as Gadamer does, that one can never escape from one’s tradition, does not mean he is insisting we endorse all traditions writ large. Gadamer is not espousing a conservative approach to tradition that blindly affirms the whole of a tradition and leaves one without recourse to critique it. Critics like Habermas and Ricoeur have faulted Gadamer for failing to insist on a critical response to tradition. These criticisms miss the mark for two reasons. First, accepting the fact that we can never entirely reflect oneself out of tradition does not mean that one cannot change and question one’s tradition. His point is that in as much as tradition serves as the condition of one’s knowledge, the background that instigates all inquiry, one can never start from a tradition-free place. A tradition is what gives one a question or interest to begin with. Second, all successful efforts to enliven a tradition require changing it so as to make it relevant for the current context. To embrace a tradition is to make it one’s own by altering it. A passive acknowledgment of a tradition does not allow one to live within it. One must apply the tradition as one’s own. In other words, the importance of the terms, “prejudice” and “tradition,” for Gadamer’s hermeneutics lies in the way they indicate the active nature of understanding that produces something new. Tradition hands down certain interests, prejudices, questions, and problems, that incite knowledge. Tradition is less a conserving force than a provocative one. Even a revolution, Gadamer notes, is a response to the tradition that nonetheless makes use of that very same tradition. Here we can also perceive the Hegelian influences on Gadamer to the extent that even a rejection of some elements of the tradition relies on the preservation of other elements, which are then understood (that is, taken up) in new ways. Gadamer desires not to affirm a blind and passive imitation of tradition, but to show how making tradition our own means a critical and creative application of it.

Similarly, true authority always requires an active acknowledgment by others. Without such an acknowledgment, one finds not true authority but passive submission resulting in tyranny. For, acknowledgment requires an active implementation of and reflection on the meaning of that authority for oneself—one based in knowledge not ignorance. Hence, understanding always has a built-in possibility for critique as we strive to make something our own and do not simply passively mimic it. Memorizing a text, for example, is no indication that one understands it; one has understood only when one can put the text into one’s own words, enlivening the text and allowing it to speak in new ways. That Gadamer’s point is not a conservative one is seen by the fact that change resulting in a new creation is the necessary result of all understanding.

Gadamer’s attention to the historical nature of understanding is captured by what he terms, “historically effected/effective consciousness” (Wirkungsgeschichtliches Bewusstein). But against historicism’s objectifying tendencies, Gadamer contends that historical situatedness does not result in restrictive limitations. For, limits are precisely what allow one to be open to what is new. It is in this context that one of Gadamer’s most misunderstood terms, namely, the “fusion of horizons,” is discussed. “Horizon” suggests the limits that make perspective possible and is marked by two main features. First, the concept of horizon suggests the situated and perspectival nature of knowing. Just as the visual (that is, literal) horizon provides the boundaries that allow one to see, so the epistemic horizon provides boundaries that make knowledge possible. Just as the literal horizon delimits one’s visual field, the epistemic horizon frames one’s situation in terms of what lies behind (that is, tradition, history), around (that is, present culture and society), and before (that is, expectations directed at the future) one. The concept of horizon thus connotes the way in which a located, perspectival knowing is yet a fecund one: without the limitation of a horizon there would be no seeing. The back- and fore-grounds requisite for knowledge are not hindrances to be overcome. For, the “view from nowhere” sees not; it is blinded by its own solipsism. A horizon, as Gadamer tells us, bespeaks the productively mediated relation between what is distant and near; it enables us to discern both what is close up and what is far away without excluding either of these positions (Truth and Method, 302). We could say that the concept of horizon meaningfully integrates the interpreter’s immediate environs and the more distant world-at-large.

Second, Gadamer stresses the open and dynamic nature of horizons. This point has been neglected in some of the secondary literature devoted to Gadamer’s conception of horizon and for this reason it is important to note that when Gadamer speaks of the horizon it is in a context in which he is trying to explain how we can have an intellectually vital relation with tradition or, as he puts it later, between “text and present”  (306). Against historicism, Gadamer argues that the ability of a contemporary interpreter to understand a text of the past does not presuppose two entirely distinct, reified horizons. It is the work of understanding to expose the unity to what at first glance is taken to be two distinct horizons, that is, past and present. Hence the “fusion” of horizons that signifies understanding. Rather than delineating a fixed and impenetrable space, Gadamer wants to highlight the capaciousness and expansiveness of a horizon: “horizon is. . . something into which we move and that moves with us. Horizons change for a person who is moving” (304). To defend horizons as distinct and fixed affirms the closed (304), incommensurable nature of horizons, where understanding, and thus truth, remains thwarted (303).

Since Gadamer denies the original diremption (separation) of discrete horizons, he rejects the assumption that understanding requires us to transpose ourselves into another, alien horizon. Horizons are not self-contained locations that can be entered into or departed from at will; they are not “objective” locations distinct from us as “subjects.” It is not the case, then, that understanding requires an act of will by which we transpose ourselves into the horizon of the other. The Hegelian themes are clear when Gadamer tells us that the transposition that occurs in the attempt to understand

always involves rising to a higher universality that overcomes not only our own particularity but also that of the other. The concept of “horizon” suggests itself because it expresses the superior breadth of vision that the person who is trying to understand must have. To acquire a horizon means that one learns to look beyond what is close at hand—not in order to look away from it but to see it better, within a larger whole and in truer proportion. (305)

The Hegelian aufhebung (sublation) underlying horizontal fusions means that whenever we are tempted to say that there are two completely distinct and incommensurate horizons we should confess the superficiality and incompleteness of such a description. That is to say, our initial efforts at trying to interpret an ancient text might make it seem as if the text does belong to an entirely different world, and Gadamer does not deny that the foreignness of the text sometimes seems to suggest its complete otherness. Misunderstanding can exacerbate the otherness of the other. But, accepting the initial challenge of difference as entailing ontologically real differences precludes change, and thus understanding. Instead, Gadamer invites us to conceive of difference as a means to transformation, which Gadamer terms “fusion of horizons.” The temptation to treat difference as an impossibility reflects a superficial response and affirms a rigid, reified notion of horizon. Noting the difference of temporally or spatially distant worlds, is, as Gadamer puts it, “only one phase in the process of understanding,” and we must take care not to “solidify” the “self-alienation of past consciousness” (306, 307). If we do so, then we will prevent the “real fusing of horizons. . . which means that as the historical horizon is projected, it is simultaneously superseded” (307). Refusing to reify difference means acknowledging that the process of understanding requires the ability to allow one’s own horizon to shift and change in light of the acknowledgment of the other, and vice versa. True understanding not only begins with difference but also requires all horizons to change; neither one’s own horizon nor that of the other is left intact (306-307). Fusion of horizons is not a war in which the dominant horizon swallows up the weaker one. In keeping with Gadamer’s anti-subjectivism, it is crucial to note that the “fusion of horizons” happens beyond our willing; the expanding of our horizon is not something we can fully control or bring about. Rather, it is through our effort to understand that a new horizon emerges.

But if there are not two reified horizons, neither is there a single, bounded horizon that occludes difference. Fusion refers to the active and the on-going nature of understanding—not a static, hegemonic unity. Any unity wrought by understanding is its effect—not its cause. Furthermore, such unity will never be total: understanding refers to a process not a final end. To defend a mono-culture is akin to positing a single, definite horizon and is thus to deny the very difference that initiates understanding in the first place. The productivity of such difference is attested to by Gadamer’s statement in his “Afterword” to Truth and Method: “what I described as a fusion of horizons was the form in which this unity [of the meaning of a work and its effect] actualizes itself, which does not allow the interpreter to speak of an original meaning of the work without acknowledging that, in  understanding it, the interpreter’s own meaning enters in as well. . . Working out the historical horizon of a text is always already a fusion of horizons” (576, 577).  Acknowledging that one can only access the viewpoint of another from within one’s own horizon is not a totalitarian effort to defend a mono-culture but a humble admission that