Category Archives: Philosophical Traditions

History of African Philosophy

This article traces the history of systematic African philosophy from the early 1920’s to 2014. In Plato’s Theaetetus, Socrates suggests that philosophy begins with wonder. Aristotle agreed. However, the pattern of discourse in the history of systematic African philosophy which began in the 1920s suggests that African philosophy began with frustration and not with wonder.

This frustration, according to Ruch and Anyanwu (1981:184-85), was due to historical events such as slavery, colonialism and racism that generated frustration with European philosophy. This eventually led to angry questions and then responses and reactions out of which African philosophy emerged. These reactions led to a great debate and then to more questions and reactions. So began the on-going spiral of arguments. The frustration was borne out of colonial caricature of Africa as culturally naïve, intellectually docile and rationally inept; the caricature was created by European scholars such as Kant, Hegel and, much later, Levy-Bruhl. It was the reaction to this caricature that led African scholars returning from Europe into philosophizing, The frustration about this treatment of Africa influences African philosophers to this day. It has a wider implication that touches on sensitive issues such as the identity of the African people, their place in history, and their contributions to civilization. To dethrone and undercut the colonially-built episteme became a ready attraction for African scholars’ vexed frustrations. Thus began the history of systematic African philosophy with the likes of Aimer Cisaire, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah, Julius Nyerere, William Abraham, John Mbiti and expatriates such as Placid Tempels, Janheinz Jahn and George James.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Criteria of African Philosophy
  3. Schools of African Philosophy
    1. Ethnophilosophy School
    2. Nationalist/Ideological School
    3. Philosophic Sagacity
    4. Hermeneutical School
    5. Literary School
    6. Professional School
    7. Conversational School
  4. The Movements in African Philosophy
    1. Excavationism
    2. Afro-Constructionism/Afro-Deconstructionism
    3. Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism
    4. Conversationalism
  5. Periods of African Philosophy
    1. Early Period
    2. Middle Period
    3. Later Period
    4. New Era
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

African philosophy as a systematic study has a very short history. This history is also a very dense one, since actors sought to do in a few decades what would have been better done in many centuries.As a result, they also did in later years what ought to have been done earlier and vice versa, thus making the early and the middle epochs overlap considerably. The reason for this overtime endeavor is not far-fetched. Soon after colonialism, actors realized that Africa had been sucked into the global matrix unprepared. During colonial times, the identity of the African was European, his thought system, standard and even his perception were structured by the colonial shadow which stood towering behind him. It was easy for the African to position himself within these Western cultural appurtenances even though they had no real-time connection with his being.

The vanity of this presupposition and the emptiness of colonial assurances manifested soon after the towering colonial shadow vanished. Now, in the global matrix it became shameful for the African to continue to identify himself within the European colonialist milieu. For one, he had just rejected colonialism and for another, the deposed European colonialist made it clear that the identity of the African was no longer covered and insured by the European medium. So, actors realized all too sudden they had been disillusioned and had suffered severe self-deceit under colonial temper. The question which trailed every African was, “Who are you?” Of course, the answers from European perspective were savage, primitive, less than human, etc. It was the urgent, sudden need to contradict these European positions that led the post-colonial Africans in search of African identity. So, to discover or rediscover African identity in order to initiate a non-colonial or original history for Africa in the global matrix and start a course of viable economic, political and social progress that is entirely African became the focal point of African philosophy.

Placid Tempels, the European missionary, wounded by this pitiable African condition elected to help and in his controversial book, Bantu Philosophy, sought to create Africa’s own philosophy as proof that Africa has its own peculiar identity and thought system, that the African is not a nobody but somebody, that he is not savage or primitive or even less than human. However, it was George James, another concerned European who attempted a much more ambitious project in his work, Stolen Legacy. In this work, there were strong suggestions not only that Africa has philosophy but that the so-called Western philosophy, the very bastion of European identity, was stolen from Africa. This claim was intended to make the proud European colonialists feel indebted to the humiliated Africans, but it was unsuccessful. That Greek philosophy had roots in Egypt does not imply, as some Europeans claims, that Egyptians were black nor that black Africans had philosophy. The use of the term “Africans” in this work is in keepingwith George James’ demarcation which precludes the Caucasian people of North Africa and refers to the black people of southern Sahara.

After these two Europeans, Africans began to attain maturation. Aimer Cesaire, John Mbiti, Odera Oruka, Julius Nyerere, Leopold Senghor, Nnamdi Azikiwe, Kwame Nkrumah, Obafemi Awolowo, Alexis Kegame, Uzodinma Nwala, Emmanuel Edeh, Innocent Onyewuenyi, and Henry Olela, to name just a few, opened the doors of ideas. A few of the works produced sought to prove and establish the philosophical basis of African, unique identity in the history of mankind, while others sought to chart a course of Africa’s true identity through unique political and economic ideologies. Some of these works were written belatedly when the early epoch had rolled over to the middle epoch of African philosophy, such as Nwala’s Igbo Philosophy, Edeh’s Igbo Metaphysics, Olela’s, Onyewuenyi’s, Anyanwu’s and Ruch’s works, etc., to explain the position that the history of African philosophy was so dense that the two epochs overlapped considerably. The criterion for identifying where each work belongs remains the focus of much debate. The ones that seek to prove or establish Africa’s unique identity belong to the early period whereas the ones that seek to clarify, justify or criticize or deny Africa’s peculiar identity belong to the middle period. The relationship can be seen between the philosophical concerns of the early and middle periods of African philosophy.

For its concerns, the middle era of African philosophy is characterized by the great debate. Those who seek to clarify and justify the position held in the early epoch and those who seek to criticize and deny the viability of such position entangled themselves in a great debate. Some of the actors on this front include, C. S. Momoh, Robin Horton, Henri Maurier, Lacinay Keita, Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, Kwame Gyekye, Richard Wright, Barry Halen, Joseph Omoregbe, C. B. Okolo, Theophilus Okere, Paulin Hountondji, Gordon Hunnings, Odera Oruka and A. F. Uduigwomen to name a few.

The preceding epoch eventually gave way to the later period which has as its focus the construction of an African episteme. Two camps rivaled each other, namely the Critical Reconstructionists who are the evolved Universalists/Deconstructionists and the Eclectics who are the evolved Traditionalists/Excavators. The former seek to build an African episteme untainted by ethnophilosophy; whereas, the latter seek to do the same by a delicate fusion of relevant ideals of the two camps. In the end, Critical Reconstructionism ran into a brick wall when it became clear that whatever it produces cannot truly be called African philosophy if it is all Western without African marks. The mere claim that it would be African philosophy simply because it would be produced by Africans (Hountondji 1996 and Oruka 1975) collapses like a pack of cards under any argument. For this great failure, the influence of Critical Reconstructionism in the later period whittled down and it was latter absorbed by its rival—Eclecticism.

The works of the Eclectics heralded the emergence of the New Era in African philosophy. The focus becomes the Conversational philosophizing, or Conversationalism, in which the production of philosophically rigorous and formidable African episteme better than what the Eclectics produced occupied the center stage. It is eclectic in that the ideals of traditional and universal African philosophy are combined. But above all, it is conversational eschewing perverse dialogues and concentrating on individual creativity, originality and reconstruction.

The sum of what historians of African philosophy have done can be presented in the following two broad categorizations to wit; Pre-systematic Era and the Systematic era. The former refers to Africa’s philosophical culture, thoughts of the anonymous African thinkers and may include the problems of Egyptian legacy. The latter refers to the periods marking the return of Africa’s first eleven, Western-tutored philosophers from the 1920’s to date. This latter category could further be delineated into four periods:

    1. Early period 1920s - 1960s
    2. Middle period 1960s - 1980s
    3. Later period 1980s - 1990s
    4. New (Contemporary) Era since 1990s

Note, of course, that this does not commit us to saying that, before the early period, people in Africa never philosophized—they did.  But one fact that must not be denied is that they did not document their thoughts and, as such, scholars cannot attest to their systematicity or sources. In other words, what this periodization shows is that African philosophy as a system first began in the late 1920s.

Because there are credible objections among African philosophers with regards to the inclusion of it in the historical chart of African philosophy, the Egyptian question will be ignored for now. The main objection is that even if the philosophers of stolen legacy were able to prove a connection between Greece and Egypt, they could not prove in concrete terms that Egyptians were black Africans or that black Africans were Egyptians. It is understandable the frustration and desperation that motivated such ambitious effort in the ugly colonial era which was captured above, but any man of reason, judging by the responses of time and events in the last few decades knows it was high time Africans parted ways with that unproven legacy and let go of that now helpless propaganda.  If however, some would want to retain it as part of African philosophy, it would carefully fall within the pre-literate or the pre-systematic era.

In this essay, discussion will focus on the history of systematic or literate African philosophy touching prominently on the criteria, schools, movements and periods in African philosophy. As much as the philosophers of a given era may disagree, they are inevitably united by the problem of their epoch. That is to say, it is orthodoxy that each epoch is defined by a common focus or problem. Therefore, the approach of the study of the history of philosophy can be done either through personality periscope or through the periods, but whichever approach one chooses, he unavoidably runs into the man who had chosen the other. This is a sign of unity of focus. Thus philosophers are those who seek to solve the problem of their time. In this presentation, the study of the history of African philosophy will be approached principally through the periods, schools, movements and only discuss the personalities within these purviews. 

2. Criteria of African Philosophy

To start with, more than three decades debate on the status of philosophy ended with the affirmation that African philosophy exists. But what is it that makes a philosophy African? Answers to this question polarized actors into two main groups, namely the Traditionalists and Universalists. Whereas the Traditionalists aver that the studies of the philosophical elements in world-view of the people constitute African philosophy, the Universalists insist that it has to be a body of analytic and critical reflections of individual African philosophers. Further probing of the question was done during the debate by the end of which the question of what makes a philosophy “African” produced two contrasting criteria. First, as a racial criterion; a philosophy would be African if it is produced by Africans. This is the view held by people like Paulin Hountondji, Odera Oruka (in part), early Peter Bodunrin, Godfrey Ozumba and Innocent Asouzu, derived from the two constituting terms—“African” and “philosophy”. African philosophy following this criterion is the philosophy done by Africans. This has been criticized as pejorative, incorrect and exclusivist. Second, as a tradition criterion; a philosophy is “African” if it designates a non-racial-bound philosophy tradition where the predicate “African” is treated as a solidarity term of no racial import and where the approach derives inspiration from African cultural background or system of thought. It does not matter whether the issues addressed are African or done by an African insofar as it has universal applicability and projected from the purview of African system of thought. African philosophy would then be that rigorous discourse of African issues or any issues whatsoever from the critical eye of African system of thought. Actors like Odera Oruka (in part), Meinrad Hebga, C. S. Momoh, Udo Etuk, Joseph Omoregbe, the later Peter Bodunrin, Jonathan Chimakonam can be grouped here. This criterion has also been criticized as courting uncritical elements of the past when it makes reference to the controversial idea of African logic tradition. Further discussion on this is well beyond the scope of this essay. What is however common in the two criteria is that African philosophy is a critical discourse on issues that may or may not affect Africa by African philosophers—the purview of this discourse remains unsettled.

3. Schools of African Philosophy

a. Ethnophilosophy School

This is the foremost school in systematic African philosophy which equated African philosophy with culture-bound systems of thought. For this, their enterprise was scornfully described as substandard hence the term “ethnophilosophy.” Thoughts of the members of the Excavationism movement properly belong here and their high point was in the early period of African philosophy. 

b. Nationalist/Ideological School

The concern of this school was nationalist philosophical jingoism to combat colonialism and to create political philosophy and ideology for Africa from the indigenous traditional system as a project of decolonization. Thoughts of members of the Excavationism movement in the early period can be brought under this school. 

c. Philosophic Sagacity

There is also the philosophical sagacity school whose main focus is to show that standard philosophical discourse existed and still exists in traditional Africa and can only be discovered through sage conversations. The chief proponent of this school was the brilliant Kenyan philosopher Odera Oruka who took time to emphasize that Marcel Gruaile’s similar programme is less sophisticated than his.  But since philosophical sagacity thrives on the method of oral interview of presumed sages whose authenticity cannot be independently verified, what is produced distances itself from the sages and becomes the fruits of the interviewing philosopher. So the sage connection and the tradition became defeated. Their enterprise falls within the movement of Critical Reconstructionism of the later period.

d. Hermeneutical School

Another prominent school is the hermeneutical school. Its focus is that the best approach to studying African philosophy is through interpretations of oral traditions and emerging philosophical texts. Theophilus Okere and Okonda Okolo are some of the major proponents of this school. The confusion however is that they reject ethnophilosophy whereas the oral tradition and most of the texts available for interpretation are ethnophilosophical in nature. The works of Okere and Okolo feasted on ethno-philosophy. This school exemplifies the movement called Afro-constructionism of the middle period. 

e. Literary School

The literary school’s main concern is to make a philosophical presentation of African cultural values through literary/fictional ways. Proponents like Chinua Achebe, Cheik Anta Diop, Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Wole Soyinka to name a few have been outstanding. Yet critics have found it convenient to identify their discourse with ethnophilosophy from literary angle thereby denigrating it as sub-standard. Their enterprise remarks the movement of Afro-constructionism of the middle period.

f. Professional School

Perhaps the most controversial is the one variously described as professional, universalist or modernist school. It contends that all the other schools are engaged in one form of ethnophilosophy or the other, that standard African philosophy is critical, individual discourse and that what qualifies as African philosophy must have universal merit and thrive on the method of critical analysis and individual discursive enterprise. It is not about talking, it is about doing. Some staunch unrepentant members of this school include Kwasi Wiredu, Paulin Hountondji, Peter Bodunrin to name a few. They demolished all that has been built in African philosophy and built nothing as an alternative episteme. This school champions the movement of Afro-deconstructionism and the abortive Critical Reconstructionism of the middle and later periods respectively.

Perhaps, one of the deeper criticisms that can be leveled against the position of the professional school comes from C. S. Momoh’s scornful description of the school as African logical neo-positivism. They agitate that (1) there is nothing as yet in African traditional philosophy that qualifies as philosophy and (2) that critical analysis should be the focus of African philosophy; so what then is there to be critically analyzed? Professional school adherents are said to forget in their overt copying of European philosophy that analysis is a recent development in European philosophy which attained saturation in the 19th century after over 2000 years of historical evolution thereby requiring some downsizing. Would they also grant that philosophy in Europe before 19th century was not philosophy? The aim of this essay is not to offer criticisms of the schools but to present historical journey of philosophy in the equatorial (African) tradition. It is in opposition to and the need to fill the lacuna in the enterprise of the professional school that the new school which can be called conversational school has recently emerged in African philosophy.

g. Conversational School

This emerging school thrives on fulfilling the yearning of the professional/modernist school to have a robust individual discourse as well as fulfilling the conviction of the traditionalists that a thorough-going African philosophy has to be erected on the foundation of African thought systems. They make the most of the criterion which presents African philosophy as a critical tradition that projects individual discourses from the thought system of Africa. Some prominent members of this school include Pantaleon Iroegbu, Bruce Janz, Jonathan Chimakonam, Jennifer Vest, Innocent Asouzu and Ada Agada to name a few. Their projects promote partly the movements of Afro-eclecticism and fully the conversationalism of the later, new period respectively.

4. The Movements in African Philosophy

There are four main movements that can be identified in the history of African philosophy, they include: Excavationism, Afro-constructionism/Afro-deconstructionism, Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism and Conversationalism. 

a. Excavationism

The Excavators are all those who sought to erect the edifice of African philosophy by systematizing the African cultural world-views. Some of them aimed at retrieving and reconstructing presumably lost African identity from the raw materials of African culture. While others sought to develop compatible political ideologies for Africa from the native political systems of African peoples. Members of this movement have all been grouped under the school known as ethnophilosophy, and they thrived in the early period of African philosophy. Their concern was to build and demonstrate unique African identify in various forms. A few of them include Placid Tempels, Julius Nyerere, John Mbiti, Alexis Kagame, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah and Aime Cesaire.

b. Afro-Constructionism/Afro-Deconstructionism

The Afro-deconstructions sometimes called the Modernists or the Universalists are those who sought to demote such edifice erected by the Excavators on the grounds that their raw materials are substandard cultural paraphernalia. They are opposed to the idea of unique African identity or culture-bound philosophy and preferred a philosophy that will integrate African identity with the identity of all other races in a common universalism. They never built this philosophy. Some members of this movement include Paulin Hountondji, Kwasi Wiredu, Peter Bodunrin, Macien Towa, Fabien Ebousi Boulaga, Richard Wright and Henri Maurier. Their opponents are the Afro-constructionists, sometimes called the Traditionalists or Particularists who sought to add rigor and promote the works of the Excavators as true African philosophy. Some prominent actors in this movement include Innocent Onyewuenyi, Henry Olela, Lansana Keita, C. S. Momoh, Joseph Omoregbe, Janheinz Jahn, George James, Sophie Oluwole and, in some ways, Kwame Gyekye. Members of this twin-movement have variously been grouped under ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, professional, hermeneutical and literary schools and they thrived in the middle period of African philosophy. This is also known as the period of the great debate.

c. Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism

A few Afro-deconstructionists of the middle period evolved into Critical Reconstructionists hoping to reconstruct from the scratch the edifice of authentic African philosophy that would be critical, individualistic and universal. They hold that the edifice of ethnophilosophy, which they had demolished in the middle period, contained no critical rigor. Some of the members of this movement include, Kwasi Wiredu, Olusegun Oladipo, V. Y. Mudimbe, D. A. Masolo, Odera Oruka and, in some ways, Barry Hallen and J. O. Sodipo. Their opponents are the Afro-Eclectics who evolved from Afro-constructionism of the middle period. Unable to sustain their advocacy and the structure of ethnophilosophy they had constructed, they stepped down a little bit to say, “Maybe we can combine meaningfully, some of the non-conflicting concerns of the Traditionalists and the Modernists.” They say (1) that African traditional philosophy is not rigorous enough as claimed by the Modernists is a fact (2) that the deconstructionist program of the Modernists did not offer and is incapable of offering an alternative episteme is also a fact (3) maybe the rigor of the Modernists can be applied on the usable and relevant elements produced by the Traditionalists to produce the much elusive, authentic African philosophy. African philosophy for this movement therefore becomes a product of synthesis resulting from the application of tools of critical reasoning on the relevant traditions of African life-world.  A. F. Uduigwomen, Kwame  Gyekye, Ifeanyi Menkiti and Kwame Appiah are some of the members of this movement. This movement played a vital reconciliatory role, the importance of which was not fully realized in African philosophy. Most importantly, they found a way out of the dead luck produced by the Modernists and laid the foundation for the emergence of Conversationalism. Members of this twin-movement thrived in the later period of African philosophy.

d. Conversationalism

The Conversationalists are those who seek to create an enduring corpus in African philosophy by engaging elements of tradition and individual thinkers in critical conversations. They emphasize originality, creativity, innovation, peer-criticism and cross-pollination of ideas in prescribing and evaluating their ideas. They hold that new episteme in African philosophy can only be created by individual African philosophers who make use of the “usable past” and the depth of individual originality in finding solutions to contemporary demands. They do not lay emphasis on analysis alone but also on critical rigor and analytic-synthesis, where the latter consists of constructive synthesis from either tradition or individual thoughts. Members of this movement thrive in this contemporary period and their school can be called the conversational school. Some of the philosophers that have demonstrated this trait include Pantaleon Iroegbu, Innocent Asouzu, Bruce Janz, Jonathan Chimakonam, Ada Agada, Godfrey Ozumba and Jennifer Lisa Vest.

5. Periods of African Philosophy

a. Early Period

The early period of African philosophy is an era of the movement called cultural/ideological excavation aimed at retrieving and reconstructing African identity. The schools that emerged and thrived in this period were ethnophilosophy and ideological/nationalist schools. The Sub-Saharan Africans, Hegel wrote, had no high cultures and had made no contributions to world history and civilization (1975: 190). Lucien Levy Bruhl also added that they are pre-logical and two-third of human (1947: 17). The summary of these two positions, which represent the colonial mindset, is that Africans have no dignified identity like their European counterpart. This could be deciphered in the British colonial system which sought to erode the native thought system in the constitution of social systems in their colonies and also in the French policy of assimilation. Assimilation is a concept credited to the French philosopher Chris Talbot (1837) which rests on the idea of expanding French culture to the colonies outside of France in the 19th and 20th centuries. According to Betts (2005: 8), the natives of these colonies were considered French citizens as long as the French culture and customs were adopted to replace the indigenous system. The purpose of the theory of assimilation, for Michael Lambert, therefore, was to turn African natives into French men by educating them in the French language and culture (1993: 239-262).

During colonial times, the British, for example, educated their colonies in the British language and culture, strictly undermining the native languages and cultures. The products of this new social system were then given the impression that they were British, though second class, the king was their king, and the empire was also theirs. Suddenly, however, colonialism ended and they found, to their chagrin, that they were treated as slave countries in the new post-colonial order. Their native identity had been destroyed and their fake British identity had also been taken from them; what was left was amorphous and corrupt. It was in the heat of this confusion and frustration that the African philosophers sought to retrieve and recreate the original African identity lost in the event of colonization. Ruch and Anyanwu, therefore, ask, “What is this debate about African identity concerned with and what led to it? In other words, why should Africans search for their identity?” Their response to the questions is as follows:

The simple answer to these questions is this: Africans of the first half of this (20th century) century have begun to search for their identity, because they had, rightly or wrongly, the feeling that they had lost it or that they were being deprived of it. The three main factors which led to this feeling were: slavery, colonialism and racialism. (1981: 184-85)

Racialism, as Ruch and Anyanwu believed, may have sparked it off and slavery may have dealt the heaviest blow, but it was colonialism that entrenched it. Ironically, it was the same colonialism at its stylistic conclusion that opened the eyes of the African by stirring the hornet’s nest. Trouble started when the departing colonialists let the Africans know, to their humiliation, that the colonial identity they brandished was a fake one. An African can never be a British or French even with the colonially imposed language and culture. With this shock, the post colonial African philosophers of the early period set out in search of Africa’s lost identity.

Many actors in this period, like George James and Placid Tempels, were not native Africans but were touched by the insincerity and cold-heartedness of the departing colonialists. James in 1954 published his monumental work Stolen Legacy. In it, he worked to prove that the Egyptians were the true authors of Western philosophy; that Pythagoras, Socrates, Plato and Aristotle plagiarized the Egyptians; that the authorship of the individual doctrines of Greek philosophers is a mere speculation perpetuated chiefly by Aristotle and executed by his school; and that the African continent gave civilization knowledge, arts and sciences, religion and philosophy, a fact that is destined to produce a change in the mentality both of the European and African peoples. In G. M. James’ words:

In this way, the Greeks stole the legacy of the African continent and called it their own. And as has already been pointed out, the result of this dishonesty had been the creation of an enormous world opinion; that the African continent has made no contribution to civilization, because her people are backward and low in intelligence and culture…This erroneous opinion about the Black people has seriously injured them through the centuries up to modern times in which it appears to have reached a climax in the history of human relations. (1954: 54)

These rugged intellectual positions supported by evidential and well thought-out proofs quickly heralded a shift in the intellectual culture of the world. But there was one problem George James could not fix; he could not prove that the people of North Africa (Egyptians) who were the true authors of ancient art, sciences, religion and philosophy were black Africans, as can be seen in his hopeful but inconsistent conclusions:

This is going to mean a tremendous change in world opinion, and attitude, for all people and races who accept the new philosophy of Africa redemption, i.e. the truth that the Greeks were not the authors of Greek philosophy; but the people of North Africa; would change their opinion from one of disrespect to one of respect for the black people throughout the world and treat them accordingly. (1954: 153)

It is inconsistent how the achievements of North Africans (Egyptians) can redeem the black Africans. This is also the problem with Henri Olela’s article “The African Foundations of Greek Philosophy”.

In Onyewuenyi’s The African Origin of Greek Philosophy however, an ambitious attempt emerges to fill this lacuna in the argument of new philosophy of African redemption. In the first part of chapter two, he reduced the Greek philosophy to Egyptian philosophy, and in the second part, he attempted to further reduce the Egyptians of the time to black Africans. There are, however, two holes he could not fill. First, Egypt is the world’s oldest standing country who also told their own story by themselves in different forms. At no point did they or other historians describe them as black people. Second, if the Egyptians were at a time wholly black, why are they now wholly white? For the failure of this group of scholars to prove that black Africans were the authors of Egyptian philosophy, one must abandon the Egyptian legacy.

There are however other scholars of the early period who tried in more reliable ways to assert black identity by establishing native African philosophical heritage. One of such is Tempels who authored Bantu Philosophy (1949). He proved that rationality was an important feature of the traditional African culture. By systematizing Bantu philosophical ideas he confronted the racist orientation of the West which depicted Africa as a continent of semi-humans. In fact, Tempels showed the latent similarities in the spiritual inclinations of the Europeans and their African counterpart. In the opening passage of his work he observed that the European who has taken to atheism quickly returns to a Christian viewpoint when suffering or pain threatens his survival. In much the same way, he says the civilized or Christian Bantu returns to the ways of his ancestors when confronted by suffering and death. So, spiritual orientation or thinking is not found only in Africa.

In his attempt to explain the Bantu understanding of being, Tempels admits that this might not be the same with the understanding of the European. Instead, he argues that the Bantu construction is as much rational as that of the European. In his words:

So the criteriology of the Bantu rests upon external evidence, upon the authority and dominating life force of the ancestors. It rests at the same time upon the internal evidence of experience of nature and of living phenomena, observed from their point of view. No doubt, anyone can show the error of their reasoning; but it must none the less be admitted that their notions are based on reason, that their criteriology and their wisdom belong to rational knowledge. (1949/2006: 51)

 Tempels obviously believes that the Bantu, like the rest of the African tribes, posses rationality which undergird their philosophical enterprise. The error in their reasoning is only obvious in the light of European logic. The Bantu categories only differ from those of the Europeans, which is why a first-time European on-looker would misinterpret them to be irrational or spiritual. This effort clearly makes a case for Africa’s true identity, which, for him, could be found in African religion within which African philosophy (ontology) is subsumed. In his words, “being is force, force is being”. And the same could be said of Alexis Kagame’s work The Bantu-Rwandan Philosophy (1956), which offers similar proofs and arguments thus further strengthening the claims of Tempels, especially from an African’s perspective. The major criticism against their industry remains the association of their thoughts with ethnophilosophy, where ethnophilosophy is seen perjoratively. A much more studded criticism is offered recently by Innocent Asouzu in his work Ibuanyidanda: New Complementary Ontology (2007). His criticism was not directed at the validity of the thoughts they expressed or whether Africa could boast of a rational enterprise such as philosophy but at the logical foundation of their thoughts. Asouzu seems to quarrel with Tempels for allowing his native Aristotelian orientation to influence his construction of African philosophy and lambasts Kagame for following suit instead of correcting Tempels’ mistake. The principle of bivalence as evidenced in the Western thought system was at the background of their construction.

Another important philosopher in this period is John Mbiti. His work African Religions and Philosophy (1969) avidly educated those who doubted Africans’ possession of their own identities before the arrival of the European by excavating and demonstrating the rationality in the religious and philosophical enterprises in African cultures. He boldly declared: “We shall use the singular, ‘philosophy’ to refer to the philosophical understanding of African peoples concerning different issues of life” (1969: 2). His presentation of time in African thought shows off the pattern of excavation in his African philosophy. Although his studies focus primarily on the Kikamba and Gikuyu tribes of Africa, he observes that there are similarities in many African cultures just as Tempels did earlier.  He subsumes African philosophy in African religion on the assumption that African peoples do not know how to exist without religion. This idea is also shared by William Abraham in his book The Mind of Africa as well as Tempels’ Bantu Philosophy. African philosophy, from Mbiti’s treatment, could be likened to Tempels’ vital force, of which African religion is its outer cloak. The obvious focus of this book is on African views about God, political thought, afterlife, culture or world-view and creation, the philosophical aspects lie within these religious over-coats. Thus, Mbiti establishes that the true, and lost, identity of the African could be found within his religion. Another important observation Mbiti made is that this identity is communal and not individualistic. Hence, he states, “I am because we are and since we are therefore I am” (1969: 108). Therefore, the African has to re-enter his religion to find his philosophy and the community to find his identity.

This is a view shared by William Abraham in his The Mind of Africa (1962). He shares Tempels and Mbiti’s views that the black African tribes have many similarities in their culture, though his studies focus on the culture and political thought of the Akan of present day Ghana. Another important aspect of Abraham’s work is that he subsumed African philosophical thought in African culture taking, as Barry Hallen described, “an essentialist interpretation of African culture” (2002: 15). Thus for Abraham, like Tempels and Mbiti, the lost African identity could be found in the seabed of African indigenous culture in which religion features prominently.

On the other hand, there were those who sought to retrieve and establish once again Africa’s lost identity through economic and political ways. Some names discussed here include Kwame Nkrumah, Leopold Senghor and Julius Nyerere. These actors felt that the African could never be truly decolonized unless he found his own system of living and social organization. One cannot be African living like the European. The question that guided their study therefore became, “What system of economic and social engineering will suit us and project our true identity?” Nkrumah advocates African socialism, which, according to Barry Hallen, is an original, social, political and philosophical theory of African origin and orientation. This system is forged from the traditional, communal structure of African society, a view strongly projected by Mbiti. Nkrumah says that a return to African cultural system with its astute moral values, communal ownership of land and a humanitarian social and political engineering holds the key to Africa rediscovering her lost identity. Systematizing this process, will yield what he calls the African brand of socialism. In most of his books, he projects the idea that Africa’s lost identity is to be found in African native culture within which is African philosophical thought and identity shaped by communal orientation. Some of his works include, Neo-colonialism: The Last Stage of Imperialism (1965), I Speak of Freedom: A Statement of African Ideology (1961), Africa Must Unite (1970), and Consciencism (1954).

Leopold Sedar Senghor of Senegal charted a course similar to that of Nkrumah. In his works Negritude et Humanisme (1964) and Negritude and the Germans (1967), Senghor traced Africa’s philosophy of social engineering down to African culture, which he said is communal and laden with brotherly emotion. This is different from the European system, which he says is individualistic, having been marshaled purely by reason. He opposed the French colonial principle of assimilation aimed at turning Africans into Frenchmen by eroding and replacing African culture with French culture. African culture and languages are the bastions of African identity, and it is in this culture that he found the pedestal for constructing a political ideology that would project African lost identity. Senghor is in agreement with Nkrumah, Mbiti, Abraham and Tempels in many ways, especially with regards to the basis for Africa’s true identity.

Julius Nyerere of Tanzania is another philosopher of note in the early period of African philosophy. In his books Uhuru na Ujamaa: Freedom and Socialism (1964) and Ujamaa: The Basis of African Socialism (1968), he sought to retrieve and establish African true identity through economic and political ways. For him, Africans cannot regain their identity unless they are first free and freedom (Uhuru) transcends independence. Cultural imperialism has to be overcome. And what is the best way to achieve this if not by developing a socio-political and economic ideology from the petals of African native culture, and traditional values of togetherness and brotherliness? Hence, Nyerere proposes Ujamaa, meaning familyhood—the “being-with” philosophy or the “we” instead of the “I—spirit” (Okoro 2004: 96). In the words of Barry Hallen, “Nyerere argued that there was a form of life and system of values indigenous to the culture of pre-colonial Africa, Tanzania in particular, that was distinctive if not unique and that had survived the onslaughts of colonialism sufficiently intact to be regenerated as the basis for an African polity” (2002: 74). Thus for Nyerere, the basis of African identity is the African culture, which is communal rather than individualistic. Nyerere was in agreement with other actors of this period on the path to full recovery of Africa’s lost identity. Other philosophers of this era not treated here include Nnamdi Azikiwe, Obafemi Awolowo, Amilcar Cabral, and the two foreigners, Janheinz Jahn and Marcel Griaule.

b. Middle Period

The middle period of African philosophy is also an era of the twin-movement called Afro-constructionism and afro-deconstructionism, otherwise called the great debate, when two rival schools—Traditionalists and Universalists clashed. While the Traditionalists sought to construct an African identity based on excavated African cultural elements, the Universalists sought to demolish such architectonic structure by associating it with ethnophilosophy. The schools that thrived in this era include Philosophic Sagacity, Professional/Modernist/Universalist, Afro-hermeneutical and Literary schools.

An important factor of the early period is that the thoughts on the basis for Africa’s true identity generated arguments that fostered the emergence of the Middle Period of African philosophy. These arguments result from questions that could be summarized as follows: (1) Is it proper to take for granted the sweeping assertion that all of Africa’s cultures share a few basic elements in common? It was this assumption that had necessitated the favorite phrase in the early period, “African philosophy,” rather than “African philosophies”. (2) Does Africa or African culture contain a philosophy in the strict sense of the term? (3) Can African philosophy emerge from the womb of African religion, world-view and culture? Answers and objections to answers soon took the shape of a debate, characterizing the middle period as the era of the great debate in African philosophy.

This debate was between members of Africa’s new crop of intellectual radicals. On one hand, are the demoters and, on the other, are the promoters of African philosophy established by the league of early period intellectuals. The former sought to criticize this new philosophy of redemption, gave it a derogatory tag “ethnophilosophy” and consequently denigrated the African Identity that was founded on it as savage and primitive identity. At the other end, the promoters sought to clarify and defend this philosophy and justify the African identity that was rooted in it as true and original.

For clarity, the assessment of the debate era will begin from the middle instead of the beginning. In 1978 Odera Oruka a Kenyan philosopher presented a paper at the William Amo Symposium held in Accra, Ghana on the topic “Four Trends in Current African Philosophy” in which he identified or grouped voices on African philosophy into four schools, namely ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, nationalistic-ideological school and professional philosophy. In 1990 he wrote another work, Sage Philosophy: Indigenous Thinker and the Modern Debate on African Philosophy in which he further added two schools to bring the number to six schools in African philosophy. Those two additions are the hermeneutic and artistic/literary schools.

Those who uphold philosophy in African culture are the ethnophilosophers and these include the actors treated as members of the early period of African philosophy and their followers or supporters in the Middle Period. These would include C. S. Momoh, Joseph Omoregbe, Lansana Keita, Olusegun Oladipo, Gordon Hunnings, Kwame Gyekye, M. A. Makinde, Emmanuel Edeh, Uzodinma Nwala, K. C. Anyanwu and later E. A. Ruch, to name a few. The philosophic sagacity school, to which Oruka belongs, also accommodates C. S. Momoh, C. B. Nze, J. I. Omoregbe, C. B. Okolo and T. F. Mason. The nationalist-ideological school consists of those who sought to develop indigenous socio-political and economic ideologies for Africa. Prominent members include Julius Nyerere, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah, Amilcar Cabral, Nnamdi Azikiwe and Obafemi Awolowo. The professional philosophy school insists that African philosophy must be done with professional philosophical methods such as analysis, critical reflection and logical coherence as it is in Western philosophy. Members of this school include: Henri Maurier, Richard Wright, Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, early E. A. Ruch, R. Horton, and later C. B. Okolo. The hermeneutic school recommends linguistic analysis as a method of doing African philosophy. A few of its members include Theophilus Okere, Okonda Okolo, Godwin Sogolo and partly J. Sodipo and B. Hallen. The Artistic/Literary school philosophically discusses the core of African norms,  and includes Chinua Achebe, Okot P’Bitek, Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Wole Soyinka, Elechi Amadi and F. C. Ogbalu.

Also, in 1989, C. S. Momoh in his The Substance of African Philosophy outlined five schools, namely African logical neo-positivism, the colonial/missionary school of thought, the Egyptological school, the ideological school and the purist school. The article was titled “Nature, Issues and Substance of African Philosophy” and was reproduced in Jim Unah’s Metaphysics, Phenomenology and African Philosophy (1996).

In comparing Momoh’s delineations with Oruka’s, it can be said that the purist school encompasses Oruka’s ethnophilosophy, artistic/literary school and philosophic sagacity; The African logical neo-positivism encompasses  professional philosophy and the hermeneutical schools; and the ideological and colonial/missionary schools correspond to Oruka’s nationalistic-ideological school. The Egyptological school, therefore, remains outstanding. Momoh sees it as a school which sees African philosophy as synonymous with Egyptian philosophy or at least as originating from it. Also, Egyptian philosophy as a product of African philosophy is also expressed in the writings of I. C. Onyewuenyi and Henry Olela.

Welding all these divisions together are the perspectives of Peter Bodunrin and Kwasi Wiredu. In the introduction to his 1985 edited volume Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Bodunrin created two broad schools for all the subdivisions in both Oruka and Momoh, namely the Traditionalist and Modernist schools. While the former includes Africa’s rich culture and past, the latter excludes them from the mainstream of African philosophy. Kwasi Wiredu also made this type of division, specifically Traditional and Modernist, in his paper “On Defining African Philosophy” in C. S. Momoh’s (1989) edited volume. Also, A. F. Uduigwomen created two broad schools, namely the Universalists and the Particularists, in his “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy” (1995). These can be equated to Bodunrin’s Modernist and Traditionalist schools respectively. The significance of his contribution to the great debate rests on the new school he evolved from the compromise of the Universalist and the Particularist schools (1995/2009: 2-7). As Uduigwomen defines it, the Eclectic school accommodates discourses pertaining to African experiences, culture and world-view as parts of African philosophy. Those discourses must be critical, argumentative and rational. In other words, the so-called ethnophilosophy can comply with the analytic and argumentative standards that people like Bodunrin, Hountondji, and Wiredu insist upon. Many later African philosophers revived Uduigwomen’s Eclectic school as a much more decisive approach to African philosophy (Kanu 2013: 275-87). It is the era dominated by Eclecticism and meta-philosophy that is tagged the ‘Later period’ in the history of African philosophy. For perspicuity therefore, the debate from these two broad schools shall be addressed as the perspectives of the Traditionalist or Particularist and the Modernist or Universalist.

The reader must now have understood the perspectives on which the individual philosophers of the middle period debated. Hence, when Richard Wright published his critical essay “Investigating African Philosophy” and Henri Maurier published his “Do we have an African Philosophy?” denying the existence of African philosophy at least as yet, the reader understands why Lansana Keita’s “The African Philosophical Tradition”, C. S. Momoh’s African Philosophy … does it exist?” or J. I. Omoregbe’s “African Philosophy Yesterday and Today” are offered as critical responses. When Wright arrived at the conclusion that the problems surrounding the study of African philosophy are so great that others are effectively prevented from any worthwhile work until their resolution, Henri Maurier responded  to the question, “Do we have an African Philosophy?” with “No! Not Yet!” (1984: 25). One would understand why Lansana Keita took it up to provide concrete evidence that Africa had and still has a philosophical tradition. In his words:

It is the purpose of this paper to present evidence that a sufficiently firm literate philosophical tradition has existed in Africa since ancient times, and that this tradition is of sufficient intellectual sophistication to warrant serious analysis…it is rather…an attempt to offer a defensible idea of African philosophy. (1984: 58)

Keita went on in that paper to excavate intellectual resources to prove his case, but it was J. I. Omoregbe who tackled the demoters on every front. Of particular interest are his critical commentaries on the position of Kwasi Wiredu and others who share Wiredu’s opinion that what is called African philosophy is not philosophy but community thought at best. Omoregbe alludes that the logic and method of African philosophy need not be the same as those of Western philosophy, which the demoters cling to.  In his words:

It is not necessary to employ Aristotelian or the Russellian logic in this reflective activity before one can be deemed to be philosophizing. It is not necessary to carry out this reflective activity in the same way that the Western thinkers did. Ability to reason logically and coherently is an integral part of man’s rationality. The power of logical thinking is identical with the power of rationality. It is therefore false to say that people cannot think logically or reason coherently unless they employ Aristotle’s or Russell’s form of logic or even the Western-type argumentation. (1998: 4-5)

Omoregbe was addressing the position of most members of the Modernist school who believed that African philosophy must follow the pattern of Western philosophy if it were to exist. As he cautions:

Some people, trained in Western philosophy and its method, assert that there is no philosophy and no philosophizing outside the Western type of philosophy or the Western method of philosophizing (which they call “scientific” or “technical”. (1998: 5)

Philosophers like E. A. Ruch in some of his earlier writings,, Peter Bodunrin, C. B. Okolo, and Robin Horton were direct recipients of Omoregbe’s sledge hammer. Robin Horton’s “African Traditional Thought and Western Science” is a two part essay that sought in the long run to expose the rational ineptitude in African thought. On the question of logic in African philosophy, Robin Horton’s “Traditional Thought and the emerging African Philosophy Department: A Comment on the Current Debate” first stirred the hornet’s nest and was ably challenged by Godorn Hunnings’ “Logic, Language and Culture”, as well as by Omoregbe’s “African Philosophy: Yesterday and Today”. Earlier, Meinrad Hebga’s “Logic in Africa” had made insightful ground clearing on the matter. Recently, C.S. Momoh’s “The Logic Question in African Philosophy” and Udo Etuk’s “The Possibility of an African Logic” as well as Jonathan C. Okeke’s “Why can’t there be an African Logic” made impressions. However, this logic question is gathering new momentum in African philosophical discourse.

On the philosophical angle, Kwasi Wiredu’s “How not to Compare African Traditional Thought with Western Thought” responded to the lopsided earlier effort of Robin Horton but ended up making its own criticisms of the status of African philosophy which, for Wiredu, is yet to attain maturation. In his words, “[M]any traditional African institutions and cultural practices, such as the ones just mentioned, are based on superstition. By ‘superstition’ I mean a rationally unsupported belief in entities of any sort (1976: 4-8 and 1995: 194).” In his Philosophy and an African Culture, Wiredu was more pungent. He caricatured much of the discourse on African philosophy as community thought or folk thought unqualified to be called philosophy. For him, there had to be a practiced distinction between “African philosophy as folk thought preserved in oral traditions and African philosophy as critical, individual reflection, using modern logical and conceptual techniques” (1980: 14). Olusegun Oladipo supports this in his Philosophy and the African Experience. As he puts it:

But this kind of attitude is mistaken. In Africa we are engaged in the task of the improvement of “the condition of men”. There can be no successful execution of this task without a reasonable knowledge of, and control over, nature. But essential to the quest for knowledge of, and control over, nature are “logical, mathematical and analytical procedures” which are products of modern intellectual practices. The glorification of the “unanalytical cast of mind” which a conception of African philosophy as African folk thought encourages would not avail us the opportunity of taking advantage of the theoretical and practical benefits offered by these intellectual procedures. It thus can only succeed in making the task of improving the condition of man in Africa a daunting one.(1996: 15)

Oladipo also shares similar thoughts in his The Idea of African Philosophy. African philosophy for some of the Modernists is practiced in a debased sense. This position is considered opinionated by the Traditionalists. Later E. A. Ruch and K. C. Anyanwu in their African Philosophy: An Introduction to the Main Philosophical Trends in Contemporary Africa attempt to excavate the philosophical elements in folklore and myth. C. S. Momoh’s “The Mythological Question in African Philosophy” and K. C. Anyanwu’s “Philosophical Significance of Myth and Symbol in Dogon World-View” further reinforced the position of the Traditionalists.(cf. Momoh 1989 and Anyanwu 1989)

However, it took Paulin Hountondji in his African Philosophy: Myth and Reality to drive a long nail in the coffin. African philosophy, for him, must be done in the same frame as Western philosophy, including its principles, methodologies, methods and all. K. C. Anyanwu again admitted that Western philosophy is one of the challenges facing African philosophy but that only calls for systematization of African philosophy not its decimation. He made these arguments in his paper “The Problem of Method in African philosophy”.

Other arguments set Greek standards for authentic African philosophy as can be found in Odera Oruka’s “The Fundamental Principles in the Question of ‘African Philosophy’ (I)” and Hountondji’s “African Wisdom and Modern Philosophy.” They readily met with Lansana Keita’s “African Philosophical Systems: A Rational Reconstruction”, J. Kinyongo’s “Philosophy in Africa: An Existence” and even P. K. Roy’s “African Theory of Knowledge”. For every step the Modernists took, the Traditionalists replied with two, a response that lingered till the early 1990’s when a certain phase of disillusionment began to set in to quell the debate. Actors on both fronts had only then begun to reach a new consciousness, realizing that a new step had to be taken beyond the debate. Even Kwasi Wiredu who had earlier justified the debate by his insistence that “without argument and clarification, there is strictly no philosophy” (1980: 47) had to admit that it was time to do something else. For him, African philosophers had to go beyond talking about African philosophy and get down to actually doing it.

It was with this sort of new orientation which emerged from the disillusionment of the protracted debate that the later period of African philosophy was born in the 1990’s. As it is said in the Igbo proverb, “The music makers almost unanimously were changing the rhythm and the dancers had to change their dance steps.”  One of the high points of the disillusionment was the emergence of the Eclectic school in the next period called ‘the Later Period’ of African philosophy.

c. Later Period

This period of African philosophy heralds the emergence of the movements which can be called Critical Reconstructionism and Afro-Eclecticism. For the Deconstructionists of the middle period, the focus shifted from deconstruction to reconstruction of African episteme in a universally integrated way; whereas, for the eclectics, finding a reconcilable middle path between traditional African philosophy and the universal African philosophy should be paramount. Thus they advocate a shift from entrenched ethnophilosophy and universal hue to the reconstruction of African episteme if somewhat different from the imposed Westernism and the uncritical ethnophilosophy. So, both the Critical Reconstructionists and the Eclectics advocate one form of reconstruction or the other. The former desire a new episteme untainted by ethnophilosophy while the later sue for reconciled central and relevant ideals.

Not knowing how to proceed to this sort of task was a telling problem on all advocates of critical reconstruction in African philosophy such as V. Y. Mudimbe, Ebousi Boulaga, Olusegun Oladipo, Franz Crahey and Marcien Towa to name a few. At the dawn of the era, these African legionnaires pointed out, in different terms, that reconstructing African episteme was imperative. But more urgent was the need to first analyse the haggard philosophical structure patched into existence with the cement of perverse dialogues. It appeared inexorable to these thinkers and others of the time that none of these can be successful outside the shadow of Westernism. For whatever one writes which is effectively free from ethnophilosophy is either contained in Western discourse or in the very least proceeds from its logic. If it is already contained in Western narrative or proceeds from its logic, what then makes it African? This became a something of a dead-end for this illustrious group, which struggled against evolutions in their positions.

Intuitively, almost every analyst knows that discussing what has been discussed in Western philosophy or taking a lead from Western philosophy does not absolutely negate or vitiate what is produced as African philosophy. But how is this to be effectively justified? This appears to be the Achilles heel of the Critical Reconstructionists of the late era in African philosophy. The massive failure of these Critical Reconstructionists to go beyond the lines of recommendation and actually engage in reconstructing delayed their emergence as a school of thought in African philosophy. The diversionary matrix which occurred at this point ensured that the later period, which began the two rival camps ofCritical Reconstructionists and Eclectics, ended with only the Eclectics left standing. Thus dying in its embryo, Critical Reconstructionism became absorbed in Eclecticism.

The campaign for Afro-reconstructionism had first emerged in the late 1980‘s in the writings of Peter Bodunrin, Olusegun Oladipo, Kwasi Wiredu and V. Y. Mudimbe, even though principals like Marcien Towa and Franz Crahey had hinted at it much earlier. The insights of the latter two never rang bells beyond the ear-shot of identity reconstruction, which was the echo of their time. Wiredu’s cry for conceptual decolonization and Hountondji’s call for the abandonment of the ship of ethnophilosophy were in the spirit of Afro-reconstructionism of the episteme. None of the Afro-reconstructionists except for Wiredu was able to truly chart a course for reconstruction. His was linguistic even though the significance of his campaign was never truly appreciated. His 1998 work “Toward Decolonizing African Philosophy and Religion,” was a clearer recapitulation of his works of preceding years.

Beyond this modest line, no other reconstructionist crusader of the time actually went beyond deconstruction and problem identification. Almost spontaneously, Afro-reconstructionism evolved into Afro-eclecticism in the early 1990’s when the emerging Critical Reconstructionism ran into a brick wall of inactivity. The argument seems to say, “If it is not philosophically permissible to employ alternative logic different from the one in the West or methods, perhaps we can make do with the merger of the approaches we have identified in African philosophy following the deconstructions.” These approaches are the various schools of thought from ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, ideological school, universal, literary to Afro-hermeneutic schools which were deconstructed into two broad approaches namely: The traditionalist school and the modernist school also called the particularist and the universalist schools.

Eclectics, therefore, are those who think that the effective integration or complementation of the African native system and the Western system could produce a viable synthesis that is first African and then modern. Andrew Uduigwomen, the Nigerian philosopher could be regarded as the founder of this school in African philosophy. In his 1995 work “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy,” he gave official birth to the Afro-eclecticism. Identifying the Traditionalist and Modernist schools as the Particularist and Universalist schools, he created the eclectic school by carefully unifying their goals from the ruins of the deconstructed past.

Uduigwomen states that the eclectic school holds that an intellectual romance between the Universalist conception and the Particularist conception will give rise to an authentic African philosophy. The Universalist approach will provide the necessary analytic and conceptual framework for the Particularist school. Since, according to Uduigwomen, this framework cannot thrive in a vacuum, the Particularist approach will in turn supply the raw materials or indigenous data needed by the Universalist approach. From the submission of Uduigwomen above, one easily detects that Eclecticism for him entails employing Western methods or African paraphernalia.

However, Afro-Eclecticism is not without problems. The first problem though, is that he did not supply the yardstick for determining what is to be admitted and what must be left out of the corpus of African tradition. Everything cannot meet the standard of genuine philosophy, nor should the philosophical selection be arbitrary. Hountondji, a chronic critic of traditional efforts once called Tempels’ Bantu philosophy a sham. For him, it was not African or Bantu philosophy but Tempels’ philosophy with African paraphernalia. This could be extended to the vision of Afro-eclecticism. On the contrary, it could be argued that if Hountondji agrees that the synthesis contains as little as African paraphernalia, then it is something new and in this respect can claim the tag of African philosophy. However, it leaves to be proven how philosophical that little African paraphernalia is.

Other notable eclectics include Batholomew Abanuka, Udobata Onunwa, C. C. Ekwealor and much later Chris Ijiomah. Abanuka posits in his 1994 work that a veritable way to doing authentic African philosophy would be to recognize the unity of individual things and, by extension, theories in ontology, epistemology or ethics. There is a basic identity among these because they are connected and can be unified. Following C. S. Momoh (1985: 12), Abanuka went on in A History of African Philosophy to argue that synthesis should be the ultimate approach to doing African Philosophy. This position is shared by Onunwa on a micro level. He says that realities in African world-view are inter-connected and inter-dependent (1991: 66-71). Ekwealor and Ijiomah also believe in synthesis, noting that these realities are broadly dualistic, being physical and spiritual (cf. Ekwalor 1990: 30 and Ijiomah 2005: 76 and 84). So, it would be an anomaly to think of African philosophy as chiefly an exercise in analysis rather than synthesis. The ultimate methodological approach to doing African philosophy, therefore, has to reflect unity of methods above all else.

Eclecticism survived in the New Era of African philosophy in conversational forms. Godfrey Ozumba and Jonathan Chimakonam on Njikoka philosophy, E. G. Ekwuru and later Innocent Egwutuorah on Afrizealotism and even Innocent Asouzu on Ibuanyidanda ontology are all various forms of eclectic thinking. However, these theories are grouped in the New Era specifically for the time of their emergence and the conversational structure they have.

The purest development of eclectic thinking in the later period could be found in Pantaleon Iroegbu’s Uwa Ontology. He posits uwa (worlds) as an abstract generic concept with fifteen connotations and six zones. Everything is uwa, in uwa and can be known through uwa. For him, while the fifteen connotations are the different senses and aspects which uwa concept carries in Igbo-African thought, the six zones are the spatio-temporal locations of the worlds in terms of their inhabitants. He adds that these six zones are dualistic and comprise of the earthly and the spiritual. They are also dynamic and mutually relate. Thus, Iroegbu suggests that the approach to doing authentic African philosophy could consist in the conglomeration of uwa. This demonstrates a veritable Eclectic method in African philosophy.

However, one of the major hindrances of Eclecticism of the later period is that it leads straight to applied philosophy. Following this approach in this period almost makes it impossible for second readers to do original and abstract philosophizing for its own sake. Eclectic theories and methods confine one to their internal dynamics believing that for a work to be regarded as authentic African philosophy, it must follow the rules of Eclecticism. The wider implication is that while creativity might blossom, innovation and originality are stifled. Because of pertinent problems such as these, further evolutions in African philosophy became inevitable. The Kenyan philosopher Odera Oruka had magnified the thoughts concerning individual rather than group philosophizing, thoughts that had been variously expressed earlier by Peter Bodunrin, Paulin Hountondji and Kwasi Wiredu, who further admonished African philosophers to stop talking and start doing African philosophy. And V. Y. Mudimbe, in his The Invention of Africa…, suggested the development of an African conversational philosophy, and the reinvention of Africa by its philosophers, to undermine the Africa that Europe invented. The content of Lewis Gordon’s essay “African Philosophy’s search for Identity: Existential consideration of a recent effort” suggests a craving for a new line of development for African philosophy—a new approach which is to be critical, analytical and universal while still being African. This, in particular, is the spirit of the conversational African philosophy beginning to grip African philosophers in late 1990’s when Gordon wrote his paper. Influences from these thoughts by the turn of the millennium year crystallized into a new mode of thinking, which then metamorphosed into conversational philosophy. The New Era in African philosophy was thus heralded. The focus of this New Era and the orientation became the conversational philosophy.

d. New Era

This period of African philosophy began in the late 1990’s and took shape by the turn of the millennium years. The orientation of this period is conversational philosophy, so, conversationalism is the movement that thrives in this era. In the Calabar School of Philosophy, three prominent schools of thought emerged, namely Interrogatory Theory, Ibuanyidanda and Njikoka philosophies. Conversational philosophy is defined by the active engagement of individual African philosophers in the creation of critical narratives either by engaging the elements of tradition or straight-forwardly by producing new thoughts or by engaging other individual thinkers. So there is critical analysis, critical synthesis, theoretical evaluation, re-enforcements and purifications of the thoughts of other African philosophers in ways that upgrade them to metanarrative of African philosophy. These also make such thoughts universal although with the primary purpose of solving African problems. In this era, the synthesis of the later period evolves into critical synthesis and the degraded critical analysis returns in full force.

Some of the noisy proponents of conversational African philosophy in this era ironically have emerged in the Western world, notably in America. The American philosopher Jennifer Lisa Vest is noted principally for this campaign. Another champion is the brilliant Bruce Janz, ironically, a white American philosopher. He too, is an ardent scholar in African philosophy. These two, to name a few, posit that the highest purification of African philosophy is to be realized in conversational philosophizing.

However, it was the Nigerian philosopher Innocent Asouzu who went beyond the earlier botched attempt of Leopold Senghor and transcended the foundations of Pantaleon Iroegbu to erect a new model of African philosophy. The New Era, therefore, is the beginning of that African philosophy, and Innocent Asouzu, according to the young Nigerian philosopher Ada Agada, arguably could be regarded as the father of it. It is believed that he beat his compatriot, the imaginative Pantaleon Iroegbu, whose career was cut short by death, to this honor. Ada Agada believes Asouzu also beat the illustrious Ghanaian philosopher Kwasi Wiredu to this honor simply by the dense, constructionist flavor of his works.. The importance of Wiredu in African philosophy cannot be fully captured in an expression,thought the most prolific says,  “One can add that without a Wiredu there may never have been an Asouzu in African philosophy.” Yet, there is a touch in Asouzu’s works that make him stand out. Wiredu may therefore be properly regarded as a forerunner.  Wiredu may be regarded as the John de Baptiste of African philosophy, in that he identified problems and suggested ways of constructing a more modern African philosophy for decades. He was preparing the mind of Africa for the arrival of a new African philosophy. In the same light, Ngugi wa Thiong’o (cf. 1986) spoke of decolonizing the African mind while Amilcar Cabral (cf. 1969), the Guinean nationalist, recommended what he called “return to the source,” a sort of re-africanization of the colonized people of Africa through philosophical re-education. This re-education is necessary for the recovery and re-integration of Africans brainwashed through the colonial education or, as some have said, mis-education to borrow the favored concept of Ivan Illich in his Deschooling the Society. The colonial mis-education, which is said to have consisted in the transfer of foreign system of thought and the denigration of the indigenous one, eventually created out of the so-called Africans what Tempels Placid, in Bantu Philosophy, calls évoléus, or the deracinés (1949/2006: 13).  These are those Africans who have been torn away from the traditional ways of life and the thoughts of their own ethnic group. They have taken on those of the West, which they have been made to believe represent civilization.

However, to do a new African philosophy is as important as to prepare for it. This is the ultimate focus of Wiredu’s campaign. Wiredu’s style of cry and hue was adopted extensively by some who became his latter contemporaries, namely V. Y. Mudimbe, who spoke of the post-colonial Africa that was invented by the West and which needs to be re-invented for authentic African philosophy to take root in his book, The Invention of African. D. A. Masolo, the Kenyan philosopher, also followed in these footsteps in his book African Philosophy in search of Identity. For him, the true African identity was corrupted and compromised by colonialism, and it was the task of African thinkers to reconstruct the true African identity from which the authentic African philosophy will grow out of particular cultural condition and pursue varied constructions of African reality, problems and methods of acquiring relevant and new knowledge.

Paulin Hountondji was another thinker to be influenced by Wiredu’s line of thought. A Benin philosopher, it seems from the extreme tone of his works that he is an unrepentant évoléus. He sees nothing good in ethnophilosophy, a term he has been incorrectly credited for coining in order to correlate it with all previous attempts to articulate African philosophy from the traditional orientation (cf. Bodunrin 1984: ft.3, 21). The difference between him and Wiredu is that he seems to advocate the assimilation and retention of the colonial system of thought. He radicalizes Wiredu’s campaign of rigor for African philosophy by outright denigration of an African system of thought. Such uniqueness he assumes is debased and crystallizes in what he calls the “myth of unanimism” (1996: 61). The undoing of his argument is the implication of his thought that to be capable of philosophizing at all, Africans must adopt the colonial system of thought. This separates him from the pack of Wiredu-loyalists. As celebrated as his works have been, they are no less controversial. For one, some think his African Philosophy: Myth and Reality is a bad mark in African philosophy. The premise of his argument is faulty from the start. The idea of African traditions and indigenous systems of thought polluting the philosophy Africans seek to construct and reduce it to ethnophilosophy is faulty. Also, the suggestion that constructing a philosophical tradition that would engender African thought systems is tantamount to constructing a debased philosophy is misleading. It is the approach, not the paraphernalia of African culture that makes a thought fall under ethnophilosophy. Despite Hountondji’s elaborate admission, the African indigenous system of thought is not inferior to that of Europe The philosophy it will yield would be unique. Two sets of questions that might startle and expose the weak-ends in Hountondji’s advocacy are:

  1. If an African indigenous thought system makes Africans and their philosophy inferior to those of the colonialist, can the assimilation of Western thought system make Africans and the philosophy they would construct through it equal to the colonialists? And could such Africans and their philosophy be truly called African with Western background thought system?
  2. When Africans leave off everything that makes them African (traditions, culture, thought system, etc.,) and adopt those of the West in a cheap search for belongingness, do they become Westerners by default? Would they still remain Africans? Or do they now become évolués? Is being unique actually the same as being inferior? And is being like the West actually the same as being non-inferior?

Hountondji’s failure to understand these lines of difference led him to what is perhaps the greatest philosophical misinformation in any liberation struggle. By way of analogy, Hountondji is asking Africans to abandon their thatch house, move across the street and seek admission into the colonialist mansion where they will sleep in the garden working as gardeners. This, he says, would make Africans equal to the European, the Lord of the Mansion. Perhaps, it is the feeling of having left the thatch house and being within the walls of the colonialist mansion that can delude such an African into thinking that he is now on par with the owner of the mansion. Hountondji forgets in his excitement that the owner of the mansion, to which the African is a gardener, does not and cannot share this sentiment. You cannot beat a man in his home; every such mansion has but one master.

The mansion of Western philosophy was not built in a day and was once like the African thatch house. When readers see the speculations of Homer, Hesiod and even the Ionian philosophers they wink in amusement. Plato’s eugenics for examples, the position of the Cynics and Aristotle’s grave ignorance with regards to slaves and women, represent the thatch house of European philosophy. For Hountondji to advise Africans to abandon their thatch house instead of seeking ways to turn it into a befitting mansion is the height of philosophical indolence. The confirmation of this indolence is that Hountondji, living within the Eldorado world of the colonialist philosophical mansion, has not been able to construct any theory to exemplify the structure he proposes for African philosophy. So where is the paradise he promises? It does seem better therefore, to remain in the thatch house and rebuild it into a mansion like Neurath’s Mariner, which was rebuilt plank by plank whilst Neurath was on board the ship, than to abandon what is truly African to become a gardener in another man’s mansion. Most African évolués, it is safe to declare, who have written or are writing on the subject of philosophy are nothing but commentators on Western philosophy.

The orientation of crying the hue and sermon-crusading of Kwasi Wiredu was replaced by Pantaleon Iroegbu’s theoretic framing. He began the actual doing of African philosophy in accordance with the recommendations of Wiredu and his apostles such as Olusegun Oladipo, Peter Bodunrin, Lansana Keita, V. Y. Mudimbe, D. A. Masolo to name a few. Theophilus Okere and the Congolese philosopher Okonda Okolo, Marcien Towa as well as Wamba Dia Wamba in some fashion can also be brought under this category.

Iroegbu in his Metaphysics: The Kpim of Philosophy inaugurated the reconstructive and conversational approach in African philosophy. He engaged previous writers in a critical conversation out of which he produced his own thought, (Uwa ontology) bearing the stain of African tradition and thought systems but remarkably different in approach and method of ethnophilosophy. Franz Fanon has highlighted the importance of sourcing African philosophical paraphernalia from African indigenous culture. This is corroborated in a way by Lucius Outlaw in his African Philosophy: Deconstructive and Reconstructive Challenges. In it, Outlaw advocates the deconstruction of the European-invented Africa to be replaced by a reconstruction to be done by conscientious Africans free from the grip of colonial mentality (1996: 11). Whereas the Wiredu’s crusade sought to deconstruct the invented Africa, actors in the New Era of African philosophy seek to reconstruct through conversational approach. The conversational approach is a method of critical engagement of tradition or the individual thinkers that aims at criticisms, reconstructions and constructive syntheses.

Iroegbu inaugurated this drive but it was Asouzu who has made the most of it. His theory of Ibuanyidanda ontology or complementary reflection maintains that “to be” simply means to be in a mutual, complementary relationship (2007: 251-55). Every being, therefore, is a variable with capacity to join a mutual interaction. In this capacity every being alone is seen as a missing link and serving a missing link of reality in the network of realities. One immediately suspects the apparent contradiction that might arise from the fusion of two opposed variables when considered logically. But the logic of this theory is not the two-valued classical logic but the three-valued African logic (cf. Chimakonam 2012, 2013 and 2014a). In this, the two standard values are contraries rather than contradictories thereby facilitating effective complementation of variables. The possibility of the two standard values merging to form the third value in the complementary mode is what makes ezumezu logic a powerful tool of thought.

Other emerging theories of conversational and reconstructive African philosophy came later. These include the Interrogatory Theory of J. O. Chimakonam; Njikoka philosophy, or integrative humanism, credited to Godfrey Ozumba and J. O. Chimakonam consolationism, which is credited to the emerging Nigerian philosopher Ada Agada and Afrizealotism developed by E. G. Ekwuru are some of the theories that have left their domains and are spreading.

Interrogatory Theory is a social philosophy which holds that societies ride on the wheels of institutions. Institutions are social structures or building blocks of any society. Repressive colonial times in Africa replaced traditional institutions with non-compatible ones ignoring any usable part of tradition and admittted without censorship every element in the imposed modernity. Hence, social structures in postcolonial Africa are ram-shackled, creating the massive retrogression of the continent’s social order. To get Africa on its feet and moving in the right direction requires the reconstruction of the social structures of Africa’s modernity and the construction of its futurity. Interrogatory theory is therefore conceived as a conversational algorithm that would provide the theoretical base for the African renaissance (Chimakonam 2014b: 1). It constructively questions rather than being exclusively critical; it questions to reconstruct rather than being merely critical to deconstruct, is dialogical rather than merely individualistic, rigorous rather than merely informative yet radical rather than being conventional.

Njikoka philosophy sees the question of being as central in African philosophy. “To be” therefore, is to be in a mutual, integrative relationship. Njikoka, meaning integration, maintains that being is being only if it is in a network of other beings. Isolated from this network, there is strictly no being because true beings depend for their existences on the mutuality and on the network to which they inevitably belong. This prompts the integrativists to regard every being as a necessarily link of reality (Chimakonam 2013: 79). Within the network of reality, every being therefore is necessary. The same logic which undergirds Asouzu’s Ibuanyidanda philosophy is the driving principle of this theory.

Ada Agada’s consolationism is an existentialist theory which reflects on African experiences. In a way, it seeks to answer such existential questions already raised in Western philosophy but from African perspectives. The melancholy man is the 21st century human beleaguered by existential problems, some of which are beyond him and leave him seeking consolation as the only remaining option. The emotional man, which Senghor erroneously announced as the Negro, was in fact, according to Ada Agada, the universal man. The much taunted reason or rationality of man emerged from emotions. Thus, science, art, religion and philosophy find their bearing in the immanent space of human joy and sadness. The goal of being in the world is a struggle to avoid sadness and achieve joy. Consolationism therefore, subverts the Western category of being and replaces it with the category of mood. For when man fails to achieve joy and is rather sad, he finds consolation by finding God or anything that serves this purpose.

Afrizealotism is an existential theory which seeks to reconstruct the African being, or humanism. In the post colonial era, the African emerged distorted, not purely African but not purely Western. This is due to the colonial contamination of the African system of thought. Afrizealotism therefore, seeks, not to purge the Western influences totally, and certainly not to admit all of African tradition without censorship, but to produce a viable synthesis by sifting new and relevant variables from the Western system that is sufficient without making the new synthesis Western. All the while, it seeks to retain enough relevant African traditions to ensure that the synthesis is African but not archaic. This presupposes a logic that is dynamic and at least three-valued. Like Iroegbu Asouzu, Ozumba, Chimakonam and Agada, the champions of Afrizealotism are building the new edifice by reconstructing the deconstructed domain of thought in the later period of African philosophy. The central approach is conversation. By engaging other African philosophers or tradition in critical and positive discourses, they hope to reconstruct the deconstructed edifice of African philosophy. Hence, the New Era of African philosophy is safe from the retrogressive, perverse dialogues which characterized the early and middle periods.

Also, with the critical deconstruction that occurred in the later part of the middle period and the attendant eclecticism that emerged in the later period, the stage was set for the formidable reconstructions and conversational encounters that marked the arrival of the New Era of African philosophy.

6. Conclusion

The development of African philosophy through the periods yields two vital conceptions for African philosophy, namely that African philosophy is a critical engagement of tradition and individual thinkers on one hand, and on the other hand it is also a critical construction of futurity. When individual African philosophers engage tradition critically in order to ascertain its logical coherency and universal validity, they are doing African philosophy. And when they employ the tools of logic in doing this, they are doing African philosophy. On the second conception, when African philosophers engage in critical conversations with one another and in construction of new thoughts in matters that concern Africa but which are nonetheless universal and projected from African native thought systems, they are doing African philosophy. So, the authentic African philosophy is not just a future project, it can also continue from the past.

On the whole, this essay discussed the journey of African philosophy from the beginning and focused through to the criteria, schools and movements in African philosophical tradition. The historical account of the periods in African philosophy began with the early period through to the middle, the later and finally the new periods of African philosophy have also been covered taking particular interest in the robust, individual contributions. The history of systematic African philosophy is a child of frustration, not wonder. This does not however, imply that African philosophers do not initiate some of their reflections from wonder; they actually do, particularly the emerging conversational school. There are still some questions which trail the development of African philosophy, many of which include, “Must African philosophy be tailored to the pattern of Western philosophy, even in less definitive issues? If African philosophy is found to be different in approach from Western philosophy, — so what? Are logical issues likely to play any major roles in the structure and future of African philosophy? What is the future direction of African philosophy? Is the problem of the language of African philosophy pregnant? Would conversations in contemporary African philosophy totally eschew perverse dialogue? What shall be the rules of engagement in African philosophy?” These questions are likely to shape the next lines of thought in African philosophy.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Abanuka, Batholomew. A History of African Philosophy. Enugu: Snaap Press, 2011.
    • An epochal discussion of African philosophy.
  • Abraham, William. The Mind of Africa. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1962.
    • A philosophical discussion of culture, African thought and colonial times.
  • Achebe, Chinua. Morning yet on Creation Day. London: Heinemann, 1975.
    • A philosophical treatment of African tradition and colonial burden.
  • Anyanwu, K. C. “Philosophical Significance of Myth and Symbol in Dogon World-view”. C. S. Momoh ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989
    • A discussion of the philosophical elements in an African culture.
  • Aristotle. Metaphysica, Translated into English under the editorship of W. D. Ross, M.A., Hon. LL.D (Edin.) Oxford. Vol. VIII, Second Edition, OXFORD at the Clarendon Press 1926. Online Edition. 982b.
    • A translation of Aristotle’s treatise on metaphysics.
  • Asouzu I. Innocent. Ibuanyidanda: New Complementary Ontology Beyond World-Immanentism, Ethnocentric Reduction and Impositions. Litverlag, Münster, Zurich, New Brunswick, London, 2007
    • An African perspective treatment of metaphysics or the theory of complementarity of beings.
  • Babalola, Yai. “Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy. A Review of the Work of P. Hountondji, M. Towa, et al.” Second Order, 2. 2. 1977
    • A Critical review of Hountondji and Towa.
  • Betts, Raymond. Assimilation and Association in French Colonial Territory 1890 to 1915. (First ed. 1961), Reprinted. Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press, 2005
    • A discourse on French colonial policies.
  • Bodunrin, Peter. “The Question of African Philosophy”. Richard Wright (ed) African Philosophy: An Introduction 3rd ed. Lanham: UPA, 1984.
    • A discourse on the nature and universal conception of African philosophy.
  • Cesaire Aimer. Return to My Native Land. London: Penguin Books, 1969
    • A presentation of colonial impact on the mind of the colonized.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan. “Ezumezu: A Variant of Three-valued Logic—Insights and Controversies”. Paper presented at the Annual Conference of the Philosophical Society of Southern Africa. Free State University, Bloemfontein, South Africa. Jan. 20-22, 2014.
    • An articulation of the structure of Ezumezu/African logic tradition.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan.“Principles of Indigenous African Logic: Toward Africa’s Development and Restoration of African Identity” Paper presented at the 19th Annual Conference of International Society for African Philosophy and Studies [ISAPS], ‘50 Years of OAU/AU: Revisiting the Questions of African Unity, Identity and Development’. Department of Philosophy, Nnamdi Azikiwe University, Awka. 27th – 29th May, 2013
    • A presentation of the principles of Ezumezu/African logic tradition.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan.“Integrative Humanism: Extensions and Clarifications”. Integrative Humanism Journal. 3.1, 2013.
    • Further discussions on the theory of integrative humanism.
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Souls of Black Folk. (1903). New York: Bantam Classic edition, 1989
    • A discourse on race and cultural imperialism.
  • Edeh, Emmanuel. Igbo Metaphysics. Chicago: Loyola University Press, 1985.
    • An Igbo-African discourse on the nature being.
  • Ekwealor, C. “The Igbo World-View: A General Survey”. The Humanities and All of Us.
  • Emeka Oguegbu (ed) Onitsha: Watchword, 1990.
    • A philosophical presentation of Igbo life-world.
  • Etuk, Udo. “The Possibility of African logic”. The Third Way in African Philosophy, Olusegun Oladipo (ed). Ibadan: Hope Publications, 2002
    • A discussion of the nature and possibility of African logic.
  • Franz, Fanon. The Wretched of the Earth. London: The Chaucer Press, 1965.
    • A critical discourse on race and colonialism.
  • Graiule, Marcel. Conversations with Ogotemmêli, London: Oxford University Press for the International African Institute, 1965.
    • An interlocutory presentation of African philosophy.
  • Gyekye, Kwame.  An Essay in African Philosophical Thought: The Akan Conceptual Scheme. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
    • A discussion of philosophy from an African cultural view point.
  • Hallen, Barry.  A Short History of African Philosophy. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2002.
    • A presentation of the history of African philosophy from thematic and personality perspectives.
  • Hallen, B. and J. O. Sodipo. Knowledge, Belief and Witchcraft:  Analytic Experiments in African Philosophy. Palo Alto, CA: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • An analytic discourse of the universal nature of themes and terms in African philosophy.
  • Hebga, Meinrad. “Logic in Africa”. Philosophy Today, Vol.11 No.4/4 (1958).
    • An extrapolation on the structure of African logical tradition.
  • Hegel, Georg. Lectures on the Philosophy of World History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, reprint 1975
    • Hegel’s discussion of his philosophy of world history.
  • Horton, Robin. “African Traditional Religion and Western Science” in Africa 37: 1 and 2, 1967.
    • A comparison of African and Western thought.
  • Horton, Robin. "Traditional Thought and the Emerging African Philosophy Department: A Comment on the Current Debate” in Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy vol. III No. 1, 1977.
    • A logical critique of the idea of African philosophy.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. African Philosophy: Myth and Reality. Second Revised ed. Bloomington, Indiana: University Press, 1996.
    • A critique of ethnophilosophy and an affirmation of African philosophy as a universal discourse.
  • Hunnings, Gordon. “Logic, Language and Culture”. Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.4, No.1. (1975).
    • A critique of classical logic and its laws in African thought and a suggestion of African logical tradition.
  • Ijiomah, Chris. An Excavation of a Logic in African World-view”. African Journal of Religion, Culture and Society. 1. 1. (August, 2006): pp.29-35.
    • An extrapolation on a possible African logic tradition.
  • Iroegbu, Pantaleon. Metaphysics: The Kpim of Philosophy. Owerri: International Universities Press, 1995.
    • A conversational presentation of theory of being in African philosophy.
  • Jacques, Tomaz. “Philosophy in Black: African Philosophy as a Negritude”. Discursos
    • Postcoloniales Entorno Africa. CIEA7, No. 17,  7th Congress of African Studies.
    • A critique of the rigor of African philosophy as a discipline.
  • James, George . Stolen Legacy: Greek Philosophy is Stolen Egyptian Philosophy. New York: Philosophical Library, 1954.
    • A philosophical discourse on race, culture, imperialism and colonial deceit.
  • Jahn, Janheinz. Muntu: An Outline of Neo-African Culture. New York: Grove Press, 1961.
    • A presentation of a new African culture as a synthesis and as philosophical relevant and rational.
  • Jewsiewicki, Bogumil. “African Historical Studies: Academic Knowledge as ‘usable past’ and Radical Scholarship”. The African Studies Review. Vol. 32. No. 3, December, 1989.
    • A discourse on the value of African tradition to modern scholarship.
  • Keita, Lansana. “The African Philosophical Tradition”. Wright, Richard A., ed. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • An examination of African philosophical heritage.
  • Keita, Lansana. “Contemporary African Philosophy: The Search for a Method”. Tsanay Serequeberhan (ed) African Philosophy: The Essential Readings. New York: Paragon House, 1991.
    • An analysis of methodological issues in and basis of African philosophy.
  • Lambert, Michael. “From Citizenship to Négritude: Making a Difference in Elite Ideologies of Colonized Francophone West Africa”. Comparative Studies in Society and History, Vol. 35, No. 2. (Apr., 1993), pp. 239–262.
    • A discourse on the problems of colonial policies in Francophone West Africa.
  • Lewis Gordon. “African Philosophy’s Search for Identity: Existential Considerations of a recent Effort”. The CLR James Journal, Winter 1997, pp. 98-117.
    • A survey of the identity crisis of African philosophical tradition.
  • Leo Apostel. African Philosophy. Belgium: Scientific Publishers, 1981.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of African philosophy.
  • Levy-Bruhl, Lucien. Primitive Mentality. Paris: University of France Press, 1947.
    • A Eurocentrist presentation of non-European world.
  • Makinde, M.A. Philosophy in Africa. The Substance of African philosophy. C.S. Momoh. Ed. Auchi: African Philosophy Projects’ Publications. 2000.
    • A discourse on the practise and relevance of philosophy in Africa.
  • Masolo, D. A. African Philosophy in Search of Identity. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994.
    • An individual-based presentation of the history of African philosophy.
  • Maurier, Henri. “Do We have an African Philosophy?”. Wright, Richard A., ed. 1984. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • A critique of Ethnophilosophy as authentic African philosophy.
  • Mbiti, John. African Religions and Philosophy. London: Heinemann,1969.
    • A discourse on African philosophical culture.
  • Momoh, Campbell. “Canons of African Philosophy”. Paper presented at the 6th Congress of the Nigerian Philosophical Association. University of Ife, July 31- August 3, 1985.
    • A presentation of the major schools of thought in African philosophy.
  • Momoh, Campbell .ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989.
    • A collection of essays on different issues in African philosophy.
  • Momoh, Campbell. “The Logic Question in African Philosophy”. C. S. Momoh ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989.
    • A defense of the thesis of a possible African logic tradition.
  • Mudimbe, V. Y. The Invention of Africa: Gnosis, Philosophy and the Order of Knowledge (African Systems of Thought). Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1988.
    • A discourse on culture, race, Eurocentrism and modern Africa as an invention of Western scholarship.
  • Ngugi wa Thiong’o. 1986. Decolonizing the Mind: The Politics of Language in African Literature. London: J. Curry and Portsmouth, N. H: Heinemann, 1986.
    • A discourse on Eurocentrism, Africa’s decolonization and cultural imperialism.
  • Nkrumah, Kwame. I Speak of Freedom: A Statement of African Ideology. London: Mercury Books, 1961.
    • A discourse on political ideology for Africa.
  • Nkrumah, Kwame. Towards Colonial Freedom. London: Heinemann. (First published in 1945), 1962.
    • A discussion of colonialism and its negative impact on Africa.
  • Nwala, Uzodinma. Igbo Philosophy. London: Lantern Books, 1985.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of Igbo-African philosophical culture.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Freedom and Unity. Dares Salaam: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A discussion of a postcolonial Africa that should thrive on freedom and unity.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Freedom and Socialism. Dares Salaam: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A discourse on the fundamental traits of African socialism.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Ujamaa—Essays on Socialism. Dar-es-Salaam, Tanzania: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A collection of essays detailing the characteristics of African brand of socialism.
  • Ogbalu, F.C. Ilu Igbo: The Book of Igbo Proverbs. Onitsha: University Publishing Company, 1965.
    • A philosophical presentation of Igbo-African proverbs.
  • Okeke, J. Chimakonam. “Why Can’t There be an African logic?”. Journal of Integrative Humanism. 1. 2. (2011). 141-152.
    • A defense of a possible African logic tradition and a critique of critics.
  • Okere, Theophilus. “The Relation between Culture and Philosophy,” in Uche 2 1976.
    • A discourse on the differences and similarities between culture and philosophy.
  • Okere, Theophilus. African Philosophy: A Historico-Hermeneutical Investigation of the Conditions of Its Possibility. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1983.
    • A hermeneutical discourse on the basis of African philosophy.
  • Okolo, Chukwudum B. Problems of African Philosophy.  Enugu: Cecta Nigeria Press, 1990.
    • An x-ray of the major hindrances facing African philosophy as a discipline.
  • Okoro, C. M. African Philosophy: Question and Debate, A Historical Study. Enugu: Paqon Press, 2004.
    • A historical presentation of the great debate in African philosophy.
  • Oladipo, Olusegun. (ed) The Third Way in African Philosophy. Ibadan: Hope, 2002.
    • A collection of essays on the topical issues in African philosophy of the time.
  • Oladipo, Olusegun. Core Issues in African Philosophy. Ibadan: Hope Publications, 2006.
    • A discussion of central issues of African philosophy.
  • Olela, Henry. “The African Foundations of Greek Philosophy”. Wright, Richard A., ed. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of African philosophy as the source of Greek philosophy.
  • Oluwole, Sophie. Philosophy and Oral Tradition. Lagos: Ark Publications, 1999.
    • A cultural presentation of African philosophy.
  • Omoregbe, Joseph. “African Philosophy: Yesterday and Today”. African Philosophy: An Anthology. Emmanuel Eze (ed.), Massachusetts: Blackwell, 1998.
    • A survey of major issues in the debate and a critique of the Universalist school.
  • Onunwa, Udobata. “Humanism: The Bedrock of African Traditional Religion and Culture”. Religious Humanism. Vol. XXV, No. 2, Spring 1991, Pp 66 – 71.
    • A presentation of Humanism as the basis for African religion and culture.
  • Onyewuenyi, Innocent. African Origin of Greek Philosophy: An Exercise in Afrocentrism. Enugu: SNAAP Press, 1993.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of philosophy as a child of African thought.
  • Oruka, H. Odera. “The Fundamental Principles in the Question of ‘African Philosophy,’ I.” Second Order 4, no. 1: 44–55, 1975.
    • A discussion of the main issues in the debate on African philosophy.
  • Oruka, H. Odera.“Four Trends in African Philosophy.” In Philosophy in the Present Situation of Africa, edited by Alwin Diemer. Weisbaden, Germany: Franz Steiner Erlagh. (First published in 1978), 1981; Ed.
    • A breakdown of the major schools of thought in the debate on African philosophy.
  • Oruka, H. Odera. Sage Philosophy: Indigenous Thinkers and the Modern Debate on African Philosophy. Leiden: E. J. Brill. 1990.
    • A survey of the journey so far in African philosophy and the identification of two additional schools of thought.
  • Outlaw, Lucius. “African ‘Philosophy’? Deconstructive and Reconstructive Challenges.” In his On Race and Philosophy. New York and London: Routledge. 1996.
    • A presentation of African philosophy as a tool for cultural renaissance.
  • Plato. Theætetus,155d, p.37.
    • Contains Plato’s theory of knowledge.
  • Ruch, E. A. and Anyawnu, K. C. African Philosophy: An Introduction to the Main Philosophical Trends in Contemporary Africa. Rome: Catholic Book Agency, 1981.
    • A discussion on racialism, slavery, colonialism and their influence on the emergence of African philosophy, in addition to current issues in the discipline.
  • Sogolo, Godwin. Foundations of African Philosophy. Ibadan: Ibadan University Press, 1993.
    • A discussion of the logical, epistemological and metaphysical grounds for African philosophy project.
  • Towa, Marcien. “Conditions for the Affirmation of a Modern African Philosophical Thought”. Tsanay Serequeberhan (ed) African Philosophy: The Essential Readings. New York: Paragon House, 1991.
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Author Information

Jonathan O. Chimakonam
University of Calabar

Gender in Chinese Philosophy

The concept of gender is foundational to the general approach of Chinese thinkers. Yin and yang, core elements of Chinese cosmogony, involve correlative aspects of “dark and light,” “female and male,” and “soft and hard.” These notions, with their deeply-rooted gender connotations, recognize the necessity of interplay between these different forces in generating and carrying forward the world. The major thinkers of China’s first philosophic flourishing—traditionally referred to as the Hundred Schools, c. 500s-200s B.C.E.—inherited and further developed this comprehensively gendered view of the world. These concepts continue to shape contemporary Chinese thought, as well. Historically, the most influential Chinese perspectives on the issue of gender come from what are commonly referred to as Confucian and Daoist traditions of thought, which take somewhat opposing positions. Many texts associated with Confucianism emphasize yang’s dominant, male-related characteristics, whereas those linked to Daoism, especially the Laozi, reverse this view, finding value in yin’s subordinate, female characteristics. However, it should be noted that Chinese thinkers, regardless of their classification as Confucian or Daoist, generally see the opposing qualities of yin and yang as integral parts of a whole that complement one another. Accordingly, the closest word to “gender” in modern Chinese is xingbie, which can be quite literally understood as a difference (bie) of individual nature or tendencies (xing). The word generally, however, refers to the physiological characteristics that then provide the basis for corresponding social identities. The genders, in terms of social roles, are not defined absolutely or theoretically, but rather through the mutually reciprocal, physical, generative relationship between male and female. They are understood correlatively, and determined by their context and dynamic tendencies as they interact with one another. Such traditions within Chinese thought may be applied as resources for contemporary feminist philosophy, albeit not without considerable caution.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Human Tendencies (Nature) and Gender
  3. Gender Cosmology
  4. Gender and Social Order
  5. Family Patterns
  6. Chinese Cultural Resources for Feminism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

There is a debate in contemporary Chinese academic circles about whether or not the idea of “gender” or “gender concepts” actually applies to traditional Chinese thought. Chinese scholars argue about the presence of “male” (xiong) and “female” (ci) characteristics, differences, and relations in the context of ancient Chinese philosophy. Although affirming this interpretation would provide a space for comparative studies with Western traditions, some thinkers believe that doing so distorts traditional Chinese thought.

Zhang Xianglong is a prominent representative of those who think that Chinese philosophy and culture have long been influenced by concepts of gender. For him, Chinese thinking is fundamentally gendered as it takes the interaction between male and female as the basic model for philosophical investigations. He further argues that it is one of the core aspects of mainstream thought in China. Zhang demonstrates that yin and yang strongly connote ideas of female and male, and identifies such gendered thought in works as early as the Zhouyi, or Yijing (Book of Changes), a traditional Chinese divinatory text of uncertain antiquity consisting of hexagrams and their interpretations, as well as throughout the later traditions of Confucianism, Daoism, and Chinese Buddhism. Accordingly, he argues that yin and women have “in principle never been doomed to be inferior” and “discrimination against women in ancient Chinese culture is neither deterministic nor universal” (Zhang 2002:5). Such a claim is dubious, as the dualistic dynamic of yin and yang, while positing both aspects as essential to existence and in this way ontologically equal, has been generally presented as inherently hierarchical. Chen Jiaqi opposes Zhang’s broader position, arguing that yin and yang are not necessarily related to gender. For Chen, yin and yang primarily involve social relationships, political forms, and weighing advantages and disadvantages. He holds that gender characteristics are too abstract to be practically relevant in this context, and do not apply directly to social forms (Chen 2003).

From a historical perspective, Chen’s interpretation is less convincing than Zhang’s. There are numerous Chinese texts where yin and yang are broadly associated with gender. While yang and yin are not exclusively defined as “male” and “female,” and either sex can be considered yin or yang within a given context, in terms of their most general relation to one another, yin references the female and yang the male. For example, the Daoist text known as the Taipingjing (Scripture of Great Peace) records that “the male and female are the root of yin and yang.” The Han dynasty Confucian thinker Dong Zhongshu (195-115 B.C.E.) also writes, “Yin and yang of the heavens and the earth [which together refer to the cosmos] should be male and female, and the male and female should be yin and yang. Thereby, yin and yang can be called male and female, and male and female can be called yin and yang.” These and other texts draw a strong link between yin as female and yang as male. However, it is important to also recognize that gender itself is not as malleable as yin and yang, despite this connection. While gender remains fixed, their coupling with yin and yang is not. This close and complex relationship means yin and yang themselves require examination if their role in Chinese gender theory is to be properly understood.

The original meaning of yin and yang had little to do with gender differences. Some of the earliest uses of yin and yang are found in the Shangshu (Book of Documents). Here, the word yang is employed six times, and five times it denotes the southern side of mountains, which receives the most sunlight. The term yin appears three times in the text, and refers to the shadier northern side of mountains. These examples are characteristic of how yin and yang function throughout Chinese intellectual history; they do not refer to particular objects, but act as correlative categorizations. In most instances yin and yang are used to indicate a specific relationship within a determined context. The way sunshine falls on a mountain is the context, and the difference between the northern and southern sides, where the latter receives more light and warmth, determines their association, which is understood as yin and yang. The terms are thereby an expression of the function of the sun on a particular place, but they do not speak to the actual substance of the objects (the sun or mountain) themselves. The specific traits of the objects can only be designated yin and yang in their functional correlation to one another. Within this matrix, yin things share commonalities when viewed in relation to yang things.

In this way, the early association of yin and yang with gender can be seen as speaking to the relationship between genders, and not to their essential or substantial natures. Yin and yang traits were thus seen as able to accurately describe broad differences between males and females as they interact with one another. Fixing the link between these categorizations, having men be yang in relation to women, who are yin, only works in a highly abstract or broad sense. For example, the Book of Changes states that the emperor is supposed to have six male ministers at the south palace (a yang position) and six wives or concubines at the north palace (a yin position). Like the southern and northern sides of a mountain, men and women are yang and yin in the way they serve the emperor. Social positions are linked to gender and understood through yin and yang. The Liji (Record of Rituals) states that “the male is outside, and the wife inside the home. The sun starts in the east and the moon starts in the west. This is the distinction of yin and yang, the positions of husband and wife.” However, in specific contexts, it is possible for the association to be reversed. For instance, in Dong Zhongshu’s Chunqiu Fanlu (Spring and Autumn Annals), we also find that “the sovereign is yang, the minister is yin; the father is yang, the son is yin.” Here males, such as ministers or sons, can also be considered yin. The entire pattern can be overturned, as well, such as in the relationship between an empress and her male ministers, where the woman is yang and the men are considered yin. However, such a situation was often considered something that should be approached with caution, as it violated natural patterns. For example, Wang Bi (226-249 C.E.), who did not care much for Dong Zhongshu’s cosmological interpretation, still argued that a woman who was too strong was not to be married.

In terms of actual practice, the more generalized and stable affiliation between yin as female and yang as male often won out, as exemplified by Wang’s idea. It was commonly appropriated as an ideological tool for backing the oppression of women, especially after Dong Zhongshu’s theories took hold. Dong, whose version of Confucianism won imperial backing during the Han dynasty, was also responsible for promoting the official establishment of a formal cosmology based on yin and yang, which became quite influential in the Chinese tradition. While he allows for men to be understood as yin and women as yang in certain contexts, overall he sought to limit the scope of such reversals. For Dong, males are dominant, powerful, and moral, and therefore yang. Women, on the other hand, are precisely the opposite—subservient, weak, selfish, and jealous—and best described as yin. As a result, female virtues became largely oriented toward social roles, especially women’s duties as wives (for example, the female virtues of chastity and compliancy). Against this biased intellectual background, oppressive practices were supported and initiated. For instance, the widespread acceptance of concubinage and female foot binding in Chinese social history expressed the inequality between genders.

However, this social inequality did not accurately reflect its culture’s philosophical thought. Most Chinese thinkers were very attentive to the advantageousness of the complementary nature of male and female characteristics. In fact, in many texts considered Confucian that are predominant for two millennia of Chinese thought, the political system and gender roles are integrated (Yang 2013). This integration is based on understanding yin and yang as fundamentally affixed to gender and thereby permeating all aspects of social life. Sinologists such as Joseph Needham have identified a “feminine symbol” in Chinese culture, rooted in the Daoist concentration on yin. Roger Ames and David Hall similarly argue that yin and yang indicate a “difference in emphasis rather than difference in kind” and should be viewed as a whole, and that therefore their relationship can be likened to that of male and female traits (Ames and Hall 1998: 90-96). Overall, while the complementary understanding of yin and yang did not bring about gender equality in traditional Chinese society, it remains a key factor for comprehending Chinese conceptions of gender. As Robin Wang has noted, “on the one hand, yinyang seems to be an intriguing and valuable conceptual resource in ancient Chinese thought for a balanced account of gender equality; on the other hand, no one can deny the fact that the inhumane treatment of women throughout Chinese history has often been rationalized in the name of yinyang” (Wang 2012: xi).

2. Human Tendencies (Nature) and Gender

Gender issues play an important role in the history of Chinese thought. Many thinkers theorized about the significance of gender in a variety of areas. The precondition for this discussion is an interpretation of xing, “nature” or “tendencies.” The idea of “differences of xing” constitutes the modern term for “gender,” xingbie (literally “tendency differences”) making xing central to this discussion. It should be noted that the Chinese understanding of xing, including “human xing,” is closer to “tendency” or “propensity” than traditional Western conceptions of human “nature.” This is mainly because xing is not seen as something static or unchangeable. (It is for this reason that Ames and Hall, in the quote above, highlight the difference between “emphasis” and “kind.”) The way xing is understood greatly contributes to the way arguments about gender unfold.

The term xing first became an important philosophical concept in discussions about humanity and eventually human tendency, or renxing. In terms of its composition, the character xing is made up of a vertical representation of xin, “heart-mind” (the heart was thought to be the organ responsible for both thoughts and feelings/emotions) on the left side. This complements the character sheng, to the right, which can mean “generation,” “grow,” or “give birth to.” In many cases, the way sheng is understood has a significant impact on interpreting xing and gender. As a noun, sheng can mean “natural life,” which gives rise to theories about “original nature” or “foundational tendencies” (benxing). It thereby connotes vital activities and physiological desires or needs. It is in this sense that Mengzi (372-289 B.C.E.) describes human tendencies (renxing) as desiring to eat and have sex. He also says that form and color are natural characteristics, or natural xing. The Record of Rituals similarly comments that food, drink, and relations between men and women are defining human interests. Xunzi  (312-238 B.C.E.), generally regarded as the last great classical Confucian thinker, fundamentally disagreed with Mengzi’s claim that humans naturally tend toward what is good or moral. He did, however, similarly classify xing as the desire for food, warmth, and rest.

Sheng can also be a verb, which gives xing a slightly different connotation. As a verb, sheng indicates creation and growth, and thus supports the suggestion that xing should be understood as human growth through the development of one’s heart-mind, the root, or seat, of human nature or tendencies. The Mengzi expressly refers to this, stating that xing is understood through the heart-mind. This also marks the distinction between humans and animals. A human xing provides specific characteristics and enables a certain orientation for growth that is unique in that it includes a moral dimension. It is in this sense that Mengzi proposes his theory for natural human goodness, a suggestion that Xunzi later rebuts, albeit upon a similar understanding of xing. Texts classified as Daoist, such as the Laozi and Zhuangzi, similarly affirm that xing is what endows beings with their particular virtuousness (though it is not necessarily moral).

It is on the basis of human nature/tendencies that their unique capacity for moral cultivation is given. The Xing Zi Ming Chu (Recipes for Nourishing Life), a 4th century B.C.E. text recovered from the Guodian archaeological site, comments that human beings are defined by the capacity and desire to learn. Natural human tendencies are thereby not simply inherent, they also need to be grown and refined. The Mengzi argues that learning is nothing more than developing and cultivating aspects of one’s own heart-mind. The Xunzi agrees, adding that too much change or purposeful change can bring about falsity—which often results in immoral thoughts, feelings, or actions. These texts agree in their argument that there are certain natural patterns or processes for each thing, and deviating from these is potentially dangerous. Anything “false” or out of accordance with these patterns is likely to be immoral and harmful to oneself and society, so certain restrictions are placed on human practice to promote moral growth. These discussions look at human tendencies as largely shaped in the context of society, and can be taken as a conceptual basis for understanding gender as a natural tendency that is steered through social institutions. For example, when Mengzi is asked why the ancient sage-ruler Shun lied to his parents in order to marry, Mengzi defends Shun as doing the right thing. Explaining that otherwise Shun would have remained a bachelor, Mengzi writes, “The greatest of human relations is that a man and a woman live together.” Thus Mengzi argues that Shun’s moral character was based on proper cultivation of his natural tendencies according to social mores.

One’s individual nature is largely influenced, and to some extent even generated, by one’s cultural surroundings. This also produces physiological properties that account for a wide variety of characteristics that are then reflected in aspects of gender, culture, and social status. Linked to the understanding of yin and yang as functionally codependent categorizations, differences between genders are characterized on the basis of their distinguishing features, and defined correlatively. This means that behavior and identity largely arise within the context of male-female relations. One’s natural tendencies include gender identity as either xiong xing (male tendencies) or ci xing (female tendencies), which one is supposed to cultivate accordingly. Thus there are more physiological and cultural aspects to human tendencies, as well. In these diverse ways, Chinese philosophy emphasizes the difference between males and females, believing that each has their own particular aspects to offer, which are complementary and can be unified to form a harmonious whole (though this does not necessarily imply their equality).

3. Gender Cosmology

The idea of gender as being fundamentally understood through respective dissimilarities (nan nü you bie) is based in the physiological differences between men and women, but also manifests in philosophic thought. In fact, in one of the earliest references to the distinction between men and women, the Record of Rituals asserts:

Once there is a difference between males and females, then there can be love between fathers and sons. Once there is love between fathers and sons, obligations are generated. Once obligations are generated, rituals are made. Once rituals are made, all things can be at ease.

The original difference between genders is—presumably through the generative power of their combination—the foundation for obligations (or morality) and thus ritual (or social moral patterns), which allows finally for harmony in the cosmos as a whole. Through the establishment of the concept that human tendencies are formed and act in line with nature, Chinese gender cosmology applies an analogous generative model of yin and yang to a general understanding of the world.

Another early text, the 3rd century B.C.E. medical compendium Huangdi Neijing (Inner Scripture of the Yellow Emperor), offers one of the most comprehensive definitions of yin and yang:

Yin and yang are the dao (“way”) of the heavens and earth, they provide the model for the net (gangji) of all beings, they are the parents of all change and transformation, and the origin of life and death, and the residence for spirit and insight. To heal illness [one] must seek its root. (Zhang 2002: 41)

Here, yin and yang are taken as a pattern embedded in the existence of all beings, thus providing the foundation for a coherent worldview. This weaves together human beings, nature, and dao (way) in a manner that creates a dynamic wholeness pervaded by and mediated through the interaction of yin and yang. This Chinese cosmological view sees all things, including humans, as borne of both yin and yang and thus naturally integrated with one another. In essence, dao represents the interaction between yin and yang, and it is in this respect that the Laozi tells us that dao is both the source and the model, or pattern, for all things (Laozi 25). More directly, the Laozi comments that all things in turn carry yin and embrace yang (Laozi 42). This shows that through yin and yang and their patterns of interaction dao provides the rhythm of the cosmos. From this perspective the genders also complement and nourish one another, and are even vital to one another.

The idea that the interaction of yin and yang generates the myriad things in existence corresponds to intercourse between male and female as the only means for reproducing life. Therefore, the nature of men and women in Chinese philosophy is not only based on purely physiological characteristics and differences, but is also the embodiment of yin and yang forces in gender. The dao of men and women are linked to the dao of the universe in terms of reproducing life. This is systematically discussed in the Book of Changes, one of China’s most ancient and influential texts. There, eight trigrams are given, which represent eight natural phenomena and can further be combined to form sixty-four hexagrams. These are expressions of the function and movement of yin and yang. They are composed of two contrasting symbols: the yang-yao unbroken horizontal line, and the yin-yao broken horizontal line. Some scholars see these as referring to the male and female genitals respectively. In this sense, the first two hexagrams qian or “heaven” (which is six yang-yaos) and kun or “earth” (six yin-yaos) can be interpreted as representing pure yin and yang. They are also responsible for the formation of general gender stereotypes in Chinese thought. They provide the gateways for change, and are considered, quite literally, the father and mother of all other hexagrams (which equates to all things in the world). The broad system of the Book of Changes attempts to explain every type of change and existence, and is built upon an identification of yin and yang with the sexes as well as their interaction with one another.

According to the “Xici Zhuan” (Commentary on the Appended Phrases) section of the Book of Changes, qian is equated with the heavens, yang, power, and creativity, while kun is identified with the earth, yin, receptivity, and preservation. Their interaction generates all things and events in a way that is similar to the intercourse between males and females, bringing about new life. The Commentary on the Appended Phrases makes the link to gender issues clear by stating that both qian and kun have their own daos (ways) that are responsible for the male and female respectively. The text goes on to discuss the interaction between the two, both cosmologically in terms of the heavens and earth and biologically in terms of the sexes. The conclusion is that their combination and interrelation is responsible for all living things and their changes. The intercourse between genders is a harmonization of yin and yang that is necessary not only for an individual’s well-being, but also for the proper functioning of the cosmos. Interaction between genders is thus the primary mechanism of life, which explains all forms of generation, transformation, and existence.

4. Gender and Social Order

Theoretically, the social order of gender in Chinese thought is broadly formed on the concepts of the heavens and earth and yin and yang. When these notions are applied to the social field, they are likened to the male and female genders. In the aforementioned Commentary on the Appended Phrases, heaven and yang are considered honorable, while the earth and yin are seen as lowly in comparison. Since the former are coupled with qian, which comprises maleness, and the latter with kun, which marks femaleness, these gender roles are valued similarly. The Inner Scripture of the Yellow Emperor says that yang’s maleness is meant for the outside, and yin’s femaleness for the inside. Men, being equated here with yang, are also associated with superiority, motion, and firmness, while women are coupled with yin and so seen as inferior, still, and gentle. Gender cosmology then largely replaced more dynamic views of gender roles with sharply defined unequal relationships, and these were generally echoed throughout the culture. The social order that emerged from this thought saw men as largely in charge of external affairs and superior to women.

The specific operational mode for maintaining this social order and its gender distinctions is li, propriety or ritual. The Record of Rituals focuses much of its discourse on specific rules regarding distinct practices reserved for certain individuals through gender categorization. In this way, wedding ceremonies are the root of propriety. Marriage is especially important because it is politically valuable for establishing and sustaining social order through designated male-female relations. In the Record of Rituals, men and women are asked to observe strict separation in society and uphold the distinction between the outer and inner. (Men being responsible for the family’s “outer” dealings, including legal, economic, and political affairs, and women the “inner” ones, such as familial relations and housework.) Social roles were thereby moralized according to gender. The Record of Rituals also tells us that the rites as a couple begin with gender responsibilities. It states, for example, that when outside the home the husband is supposed to lead the way and that the wife should follow. However, within the home women were supposed to obey men as well, even boys. Before marriage, a girl was expected to listen to her father, and then after marriage to be obedient to her husband, or to their sons if he died. These general guidelines are commonly referred to in other texts as the sancong side or “three obediences and four virtues,” which dominated theories of proper social ordering for most of China’s history.

The four virtues—women’s virtue (fude), women’s speech (fuyan), women’s appearance (furong), and women’s work (fugong)—were expounded on by Ban Zhao (45-120 C.E.) in her book Nüjie (Admonitions for Women). She believed that women should be conservative, humble, and quiet in expressing ritual or filial propriety as their virtue. In the same way, a women’s speech should not be “flowery” or persuasive, but yielding and circumspect. She should also pay close attention to her appearance, be clean and proper, and act especially carefully around guests and in public. Her work consists mainly in household practicalities, such as weaving and food preparation.

The sancong (three obediences) can also be regarded as a forerunner to the san gang, or “three cardinal guides,” of the later Han dynasty (25-220 C.E.). The three cardinal guides were put forward by the aforementioned Dong Zhongshu and contributed greatly to integrating yin and yang gender cosmology into the framework of Confucian ethics. These guides are regulations about relationships—they are defined as the ruler guiding ministers, fathers guiding sons, and husbands guiding wives. Although these rules lack specific content, they do provide a general understanding for ordering society that is concentrated on proper relationships, which is the basic element for morality in many Confucian texts. Here a strong gender bias emerges. The partiality shown toward the elevated position of husbands is only further bolstered by the other two relationships being completely male-based. The only time females are mentioned they are last. Moreover, the ranking of the relationships themselves are hierarchical, relegating women to the lowest level of this order.

Dong also elaborated on distinguishing goodness from evil based on elevating things associated with yang and its general characteristics as ultimately superior to yin, and at the same time emphasized their connections to gender characteristics. This further reinforces deep gender bias. The language of Dong’s Spring and Autumn Annals praises males and presents a negative view of females and all things feminine. The text explicitly argues that even if there are ways in which the husband is inferior to the wife, the former is still yang and therefore better overall. Even more drastically, it states that evilness and all things bad belong to yin, while goodness and all things good are associated with yang, which clearly implicitly links good and evil to male and female, respectively. There are places where, due to the interrelated correlative relationship between yin and yang, the female might be yang and therefore superior in certain aspects, but since she is mostly yin, she is always worse overall. The text even goes so far as to require that relationships between men and women be adjusted to strictly conform to the three cardinal guides. Rules require that subjects obey their rulers, children their fathers, and wives their husbands. In Dong’s other writings, he goes a step further, declaring that the three cardinal guides are a mandate of the heavens. This gives cosmological support to his social arrangement, equating male superiority with the natural ordering of all things.

In the Baihutong (Philosophical Discussions in the White Tiger Hall), which is a collection of court debates from the later Han dynasty, discourse on Dong’s guidelines is taken further. During this time, Confucianism was established as the official state ideology and heavily influenced many areas of politics, including court functioning, policies, and education. This, in turn, provided the foundation for a Confucian society in which this ideology successfully penetrated the daily lives of the state’s entire populace. Dong’s interpretation of ancient texts, including his reading of gender cosmology, became especially powerful as Confucianism believes that the basis for social order and morality begins in human interaction, not individuals. In this context, people are mainly understood according to their roles in society or relationships with others, which were already established as naturally hierarchical in the Analects (the record of Confucius’s actions and words). Dong’s work added a distinct favoring of male over female that became increasingly established and widespread as Confucianism became increasingly influential. Conceived of as analogous to the relationship between rulers and ministers, teachers and students, or parents and children, the two sexes were generally assumed to be a natural ordering of the superior and inferior.

Although these sexist trends are not found in earlier texts—at least not explicitly—they became quite common after the Han dynasty. (The most controversial exception to this is in Analects 17:25, where Confucius is recorded to have equated petty people and women; however, it is unclear exactly what he meant, and whether or not he was referring to women in general or just “petty” ones.) By the Song dynasty (960-1279 C.E.), mainstream political and intellectual discourse viewed both the ability and moral character of women as significantly inferior to males. The Confucian classic known as the Shijing (Book of Poetry) includes the controversial line “Male intellect builds states, female intellect topples states” (Zhou 2002: 489), which in the Song dynasty became understood as an argument for keeping women out of politics and state affairs. On this basis, the Neo-Confucian thinker Zhu Xi  (1130-1200) criticized Wu Zetian, China’s only female emperor, arguing that failure to observe Dong’s three cardinal guides was ultimately responsible for the chaos, violence, and civil wars that had followed the Tang dynasty (618-907 C.E.). Later, during the Ming dynasty (1368-1644 C.E.), the Confucian thinker Zhang Dai (1597-1679 C.E.) developed the idea that males express virtuousness through their ability to debate and contend with one another, while women find virtuousness in lacking this skill. Although he did not expound much on this idea, it was taken to mean that women were both unable and ought not contend with others, including their husband. Their obedience was a display of morality. Similarly, men were expected to dominate their wives in a somewhat disrespectful manner in order to display their own ethical cultivation. In more extreme interpretations, Zhang’s notion was read as “a woman without talent is virtuous.” This was linked to the cosmological understanding of gender roles so that failure to follow these guides meant the betrayal of natural patterns—the traditional foundation for ethical norms. During this time, imperial law stated that any man over forty without a male heir must take on a concubine to aid him in producing one.

The domination of these views in both culture and philosophy caused the Chinese tradition to attach great importance to hierarchical gender roles. Social order based itself on cosmological theories that were automatically normative and constituted guidelines for moral cultivation. Despite the Book of Changes and Laozi’s emphasis on the importance of the interaction between yin and yang as complementary and mutually constitutive, women were generally regarded as inferior.

5. Family Patterns

Ideal political and social order in the state was regarded as a replication of the family model on a larger scale. The way neighbors interacted, friends treated one another, and ministers served rulers were all based on models of familial relationships. Early Confucian texts provided the ideological foundation for this pattern by arguing that morality must be cultivated at home first before it could be adequately practiced in society. In terms of gender, the hierarchical relationships in socio-political spheres were simply extensions of the superiority of husbands in spousal relations. The Record of Rituals explains, “Just as two rulers cannot coexist in one country, a household cannot have two masters; only one can govern” (Zheng 2008: 2353). Dong Zhongshu’s three cardinal guides promoted this attitude by requiring that wives listen to their husbands in the same way that children should listen to fathers and then further placing the spousal relationship below that of father and son. Zhu Xi bolstered this order by arguing that children should respect both parents, but that the father should be absolutely superior to the mother. Zhu recognized that there were aspects of life, mostly household affairs (nei), that women were well suited for, but saw men’s duties as superior, and therefore advocated that males always dominate females.

In line with the mutual relationship of yin and yang emphasized by the Book of Changes and Daoism, marriages were largely understood as being a deferential equivalence. The wedding rites in the Record of Rituals say that marriages are important for maintaining ancestral sacrifice and family lineages. The text describes that when a groom gives a salute, the bride can sit, and that during the ceremony they should eat at the same table and drink from the same bottle to display their mutual affection, trust, and support. This also aligns the woman, who had no official rank of her own, with her husband’s rank. The Record of Rituals further records that during China’s first dynasties, enlightened monarchs respected their wives and children, and that this is in line with natural order or dao. The Xiaojing (Classic of Filial Piety) also says that rulers should never insult even their concubines, let alone their wives. Although only leaders are mentioned, according to Chinese ethical systems people are supposed to emanate their superiors, so this deference would ideally be practiced in every household. However, such roles were largely based on function. For men this meant learning, working, and carrying on the ancestral line. Women were in charge of household affairs and principally responsible for producing a male heir. If they failed in the latter, their martial function was largely unfulfilled, which reflected poorly on the husband, as well. Since the women’s function was largely mechanistic, her status was much lower and she was essentially anonymous, without independent social standing. Men could take on concubines to produce heirs or simply for pleasure, and while wives were “in charge” of concubines, they could also be (albeit rarely) replaced by them, and would have to serve the sons of concubines if they produced none of their own. Legally, men owned their wives, and there was often little practical recourse for a woman against her husband, even though the laws of certain periods allowed for it.

The Book of Poetry contains a large number of poems and songs describing marriage and love between men and women, some of which express the joys and sorrows of women. The collection includes lamentations of men going off on business or to war, and women’s complaints of being abandoned by their husbands after concubines are purchased. They are meant to remind husbands of social expectations and moral responsibilities. The Lienüzhuan (Biographies of Virtuous Women) and Xunzi both argue that the husband-wife relation is foundational for the family, and therefore for a stable society, as well. (The Zhongyong, or Doctrine of the Mean, adds that the sage’s virtue is found most simply in husband-wife relations.) Liu Xiang (77 B.C.E.-6 C.E.), the complier of the Lienüzhuan, firmly believed that morality starts in the family and reverberates out into society. He grouped virtuous women into six categories, or virtues: maternal rectitude (muyi), sage-like intelligence (xianming), humane wisdom (renzhi), purity and deference (zhenshun), chastity and dutifulness (jieyi), and skill in arguments and communication (biantong). Later editions of this text became less gender specific, but Liu emphasized women who were able to carry out certain female-related duties in role-specific conditions (including those of daughter, wife, daughter-in-law, and mother). Although Liu did not mention it, later texts argued that widows should not remarry or take on lovers. The Neo-Confucian thinker Cheng Yi  (1033-1107) was one of the harshest interpreters of widow fidelity, claiming that they should rather starve to death than take on a second husband. Zhu Xi, who disagreed with Cheng on many issues, argued that this was not practical; yet it was generally regarded as virtuous, even if not widely practiced. Cheng’s proposal was also important because he did not restrict such devotion to women, which created a rare sense of equality (of which Zhu also disapproved).

Analogous to yin and yang, the relationship of the wife and “inner” with the husband and “outer” is conceived of as complementary, not dualistic. According to the functional distinction of “inner” and “outer,” women were responsible for everything in the house, while men dominated external affairs. The most basic form of this division was given as “Men plow and women weave” (nan geng nü zhi). However, this distinction is not equivalent to the Western concepts of private and public. In fact, during the Wei-Jin period of national disunity (265-420 C.E.), it was common for women in northern Chinese states to handle family legal matters at court, go out to present gifts, and handle certain business matters. The woman’s role was not always marginalized, but it was focused on specific tasks. Chinese families often believed that educating their daughters well (though not necessarily in literary learning) was the precondition for improving the family and encouraging orderliness. Women were also often the primary caretakers and to some extent educators of all children, male or female—an invaluable role for the entire household. A couple’s shared goals, like obtaining wealth or educating children, were designated into separate spheres that either the wife or husband would control. The third-century B.C.E. philosophical miscellany known as Lüshi Chunqiu (Mr. Lü’s Spring and Autumn Annals) declares that husbands should have clothes to wear without weaving and wives have food to eat without farming because of their division of labor, which allows for a more efficacious family and society. Individual differences should be acknowledged so that the couple can support and assist one another.

6. Chinese Cultural Resources for Feminism

Taking yin and yang as an analogy for female and male, classical Chinese thought presents a complex picture of their interaction. Firstly, with thinkers such as Dong Zhongshu, the split between the two genders can be seen as relatively fixed. On this basis regulations on gender roles are equally stabilized, so that they are considered complementary, but not equal. The second major trend, seen most explicitly in the Laozi, values the inseparability of yin and yang, which is equated with the female and male. This interpretation explores the productive and efficacious nature of yin, or feminine powers. While not necessarily feminist, this latter view provides a robust resource for exploring feminism in Chinese thought. These two orientations were developed along the lines of their respective representatives in Chinese traditions.

Like the relationship between yin and yang, a complementary relationship can be seen between these two views on gender. Thinkers such as Confucius, Mengzi, Xunzi, Dong Zhongshu, and Zhu Xi are often taken to represent Confucianism, which belongs to the first viewpoint. The Laozi and Zhuangzi have then been seen as opposed to these thinkers, and are representative of Daoism. However, the actual relationship between these two “schools” is much more integrated. For example, Wang Bi wrote what is generally regarded as the standard commentary on the Laozi, and yet he considered Confucius to be a higher sage than Laozi. Similarly, actual Chinese social practices cannot be traced back to either Daoism or Confucianism exclusively, though one or the other may be more emphasized in particular cases. Taken as separate, they each highlight different aspects that, when integrated with one another, represent a whole. Although they are sometimes read as opposing views, both are equally indispensable for comprehending Chinese culture and history.

Despite the possibility of reading feminism into many Chinese texts, there can be no doubt that the Chinese tradition, as practiced, was largely sexist. For the most part, the inferior position of women was based on readings (whether or not they were misinterpretations) of texts generally classified as Confucian, such as the Record of Rituals, Book of Poetry, or Analects. On the other hand, other texts regarded as Confucian—such as the Book of Changes or Classic of Filial Piety—harbor rich resources for feminism in China. So while sexist practices are and were frequently defended on the basis of Confucian texts, this is limited to particular passages, and does not speak to the complexity of either Confucianism or Chinese traditions in general.

As a response to dominant practices, the Laozi—regardless of whether it was formed earlier or later than other major texts, such as the Analects—favors notions that counter (but do not necessarily oppose) early social values. While the Record of Rituals and Book of Poetry contain or promote hierarchical interpretations of gender issues, the Laozi clearly promotes nominally feminine characteristics and values. (This puts the Laozi in conflict with some branches of feminism that seek to destroy notions of “female” or gender-oriented traits and tendencies.) While this does not necessarily equate the Laozi with what is now called “feminism,” it does provide Chinese culture with a potential resource for reviving or creating conceptions of  femininity in a more positive light.

The major philosophical concept in the Laozi is dao (way). The first chapter of the text claims that the unchanging dao cannot be spoken of, but it does offer clues in the form of a variety of images that appear throughout its eighty-one chapters. Several of the descriptions associate dao with the feminine, maternal, or female “gate.” In this context, dao is given three important connotations. It is responsible for the origin of all things, it is all things, and it provides the patterns that they should follow. The comparison to a woman’s body and its function of generation (sheng) identify dao as feminine, and therefore speak to the power of the female. The Laozi can therefore be read as advocating that female powers and positions are superior to their male counterparts. In modern scholarship, this is frequently noted, and several scholars have attempted to use the Laozi to support Chinese and comparative feminist studies. Images in the text strongly support these investigations.

For example, the text speaks of the gushen, the “spirit of the valley,” which is said to “never die” and is called xuanpin, or “mysterious femininity” (ch. 6). The character for “spirit,” gu, originally meant “generation.” It is identified with sheng (part of the character for gender and tendencies), and its shape is sometimes taken to represent the female genitals. In other places, dao is referred to as the mother and said to have given birth to all things (ch. 52). Contemporary scholars also point out that there are no “male” images or traditionally male traits linked to dao in the Laozi. Dao’s characteristics, such as being “low,” “soft,” and “weak,” are all associated with yin and femininity, thereby forging a strong link between dao and the female.

Yin tendencies are not, however, exclusively valued. The Laozi offers a more balanced view, which is why it can be used as a resource of feminism, but is not necessarily feminist itself. For example, it says that all things come from dao and that they carry the yin and embrace the yang, and that their blending is what produces harmony in the world (ch. 42). Yin is arguably more basic, but is prized for its ability to overcome yang, just as the soft can overcome the hard and stillness can defeat movement. These notions are applied to many aspects of life, including sexual, political, and military examples. These examples revere female traits, arguing that yin should be acknowledged for its numerous strengths, but do not reject the importance of yang.

Taken as a political text, the Laozi argues that the ruler should take on more female than male traits in order to properly govern the world. This is supposed to allow him to remain “still” while others are in motion, ideally self-ordering. Although this confirms the usefulness of female virtue, it is not an argument for it being superior, or even equal to male counterparts. Rather, it demonstrates how female characteristics can be used to promote efficacy.

Given that sexist practices have largely be defended by reference to texts and scholars that self-identify with the Confucian tradition, it is easy to see why contemporary scholars have looked to the Laozi as one of the major sources for constructing Chinese feminism. It is certainly the first major Chinese philosophical text that explicitly promotes a variety of female traits and values, which allows room for feminist consciousness and discourse.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger T., and David L. Hall. Thinking from the Han: Self, Truth, and Transcendence in Chinese and Western Culture. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1998.
    • (This book includes a chapter on gender roles that outlines how the Confucian tradition can be used to establish a foundation for Chinese gender equality.)
  • Ames, Roger T., and Henry Rosemont Jr., trans. The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation. New York, NY: Ballantine Books, 1998.
    • (An excellent translation of the Confucian Analects.)
  • Bossler, Beverly. Courtesans, Concubines and the Cult of Female Fidelity: Gender and Social Change in China, 1000–1400. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2012.
    • (A superb study of how female roles and virtues shaped Chinese family life, politics,and academics.)
  • Chen, Jiaqi. “Critique of Zhang Xianglong.” Zhejiang Academic Journal 4 (2003): 127–130.
    • (This article points out inequalities of gender rules in Chinese philosophy and social systems.)
  • Moeller, Hans-Georg, trans. Daodejing: A Complete Translation and Commentary. Chicago, IL: Open Court, 2007.
    • (Moeller’s commentary is sensitive to feminist interpretations of the Daodejing or Laozi.)
  • Rosenlee, Li-Hsiang. Confucianism and Women. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2006.
    • (A book-length study of gender roles in the Confucian tradition.)
  • Van Norden, Bryan, trans. Mengzi, with Selections from Traditional Commentaries. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2008.
    • (A masterful translation of the Mengzi with commentaries from traditional Chinese scholars.)
  • Wang, Robin R. Yinyang: The Way of Heaven and Earth in Chinese Thought and Culture. NY: Cambridge University Press, 2012.
    • (The best study of Chinese yinyang theory in English. The text also includes discussions of gender issues.)
  • Wang, Robin R. Images of Women in Chinese Thought and Culture: Writings from the Pre-Qin Period through the Song Dynasty. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2003.
    • (An excellent resource for gender issues in Chinese thought.)


Author Information

Lijuan Shen
Xi’an University of Architecture and Technology


Paul D’Ambrosio
East China Normal University

Continental Rationalism

Continental rationalism is a retrospective category used to group together certain philosophers working in continental Europe in the 17th and 18th centuries, in particular, Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, especially as they can be regarded in contrast with representatives of “British empiricism,” most notably, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Whereas the British empiricists held that all knowledge has its origin in, and is limited by, experience, the Continental rationalists thought that knowledge has its foundation in the scrutiny and orderly deployment of ideas and principles proper to the mind itself. The rationalists did not spurn experience as is sometimes mistakenly alleged; they were thoroughly immersed in the rapid developments of the new science, and in some cases led those developments. They held, however, that experience alone, while useful in practical matters, provides an inadequate foundation for genuine knowledge.

The fact that “Continental rationalism” and “British empiricism” are retrospectively applied terms does not mean that the distinction that they signify is anachronistic. Leibniz’s New Essays on Human Understanding, for instance, outlines stark contrasts between his own way of thinking and that of Locke, which track many features of the rationalist/empiricist distinction as it tends to be applied in retrospect. There was no rationalist creed or manifesto to which Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, all subscribed (nor, for that matter, was there an empiricist one). Nevertheless, with due caution, it is possible to use the “Continental rationalism” category (and its empiricist counterpart) to highlight significant points of convergence in the philosophies of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, inter alia. These include: (1) a doctrine of innate ideas; (2) the application of mathematical method to philosophy; and (3) the use of a priori principles in the construction of substance-based metaphysical systems.

Table of Contents

  1. Origin and History of the Term "Rationalism"
  2. Innate Ideas
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
    4. Malebranche
  3. Mathematical Method
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
  4. A Priori Principles
    1. Intelligibility and the Cartesian Circle
    2. Substance Metaphysics
      1. Descartes
      2. Spinoza
      3. Leibniz
  5. Continental Rationalism, Experience, and Experiment
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Origin and History of the Term "Rationalism"

According to the Historisches Worterbuch der Philosophie, the word “rationaliste” appears in 16th century France, as early as 1539, in opposition to “empirique.” In his New Organon, first published in 1620 (in Latin), Francis Bacon juxtaposes rationalism and empiricism in memorable terms:

Those who have treated of the sciences have been either empiricists [Empirici] or dogmatists [Dogmatici]. Empiricists [Empirici], like ants, simply accumulate and use; Rationalists [Rationales], like spiders, spin webs from themselves; the way of the bee is in between: it takes material from the flowers of the garden and the field; but it has the ability to convert and digest them. (The New Organon, p. 79; Spedding, 1, 201)

Bacon’s association of rationalists with dogmatists in this passage foreshadows Kant’s use of the term “dogmatisch” in reference, especially, to the Wolffian brand of rationalist philosophy prevalent in 18th century Germany. Nevertheless, Bacon’s use of “rationales” does not refer to “Continental rationalism,” which developed only after the New Organon, but rather to the Scholastic philosophy that dominated the medieval period. Moreover, while Bacon is, in retrospect, often considered the father of modern empiricism, the above-quoted passage shows him no friendlier to the empirici than to the rationales. Thus, Bacon’s juxtaposition of rationalism and empiricism should not be confused with the distinction as it develops over the course of the 17th and 18th centuries, although his imagery is certainly suggestive.

The distinction appears in an influential form as the backdrop to Kant’s critical philosophy (which is often loosely understood as a kind of synthesis of certain aspects of Continental rationalism and British empiricism) at the end of the 18th century. However, it was not until the time of Hegel in the first half of the 19th century that the terms “rationalism” and “empiricism” were applied to separating the figures of the 17th and 18th centuries into contrasting epistemological camps in the fashion with which we are familiar today. In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, Hegel describes an opposition between “a priori thought,” on the one hand, according to which “the determinations which should be valid for thought should be taken from thought itself,” and, on the other hand, “the determination that we must begin and end and think, etc., from experience.” He describes this as the opposition between “Rationalismus and “Empirismus” (Werke 20, 121).

2. Innate Ideas

Perhaps the best recognized and most commonly made distinction between rationalists and empiricists concerns the question of the source of ideas. Whereas rationalists tend to think (with some exceptions discussed below) that some ideas, at least, such as the idea of God, are innate, empiricists hold that all ideas come from experience. Although the rationalists tend to be remembered for their positive doctrine concerning innate ideas, their assertions are matched by a rejection of the notion that all ideas can be accounted for on the basis of experience alone. In some Continental rationalists, especially in Spinoza, the negative doctrine is more apparent than the positive. The distinction is worth bearing in mind, in order to avoid the very false impression that the rationalists held to innate ideas because the empiricist alternative had not come along yet. (In general, the British empiricists came after the rationalists.) The Aristotelian doctrine, nihil in intellectu nisi prius in sensu (nothing in the intellect unless first in the senses), had been dominant for centuries, and it was in reaction against this that the rationalists revived in modified form the contrasting Platonic doctrine of innate ideas.

a. Descartes

Descartes distinguishes between three kinds of ideas: adventitious (adventitiae), factitious (factae), and innate (innatae). As an example of an adventitious idea, Descartes gives the common idea of the sun (yellow, bright, round) as it is perceived through the senses. As an example of a factitious idea, Descartes cites the idea of the sun constructed via astronomical reasoning (vast, gaseous body). According to Descartes, all ideas which represent “true, immutable, and eternal essences” are innate. Innate ideas, for Descartes, include the idea of God, the mind, and mathematical truths, such as the fact that it pertains to the nature of a triangle that its three angles equal two right angles.

By conceiving some ideas as innate, Descartes does not mean that children are born with fully actualized conceptions of, for example, triangles and their properties. This is a common misconception of the rationalist doctrine of innate ideas. Descartes strives to correct it in Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, where he compares the innateness of ideas in the mind to the tendency which some babies are born with to contract certain diseases: “it is not so much that the babies of such families suffer from these diseases in their mother’s womb, but simply that they are born with a certain ‘faculty’ or tendency to contract them” (CSM I, 304). In other words, innate ideas exist in the mind potentially, as tendencies; they are then actualized by means of active thought under certain circumstances, such as seeing a triangular figure.

At various points, Descartes defends his doctrine of innate ideas against philosophers (Hobbes, Gassendi, and Regius, inter alia) who hold that all ideas enter the mind through the senses, and that there are no ideas apart from images. Descartes is relatively consistent on his reasons for thinking that some ideas, at least, must be innate. His principal line of argument proceeds by showing that there are certain ideas, for example, the idea of a triangle, that cannot be either adventitious or factitious; since ideas are either adventitious, factitious, or innate, by process of elimination, such ideas must be innate.

Take Descartes’ favorite example of the idea of a triangle. The argument that the idea of a triangle cannot be adventitious proceeds roughly as follows. A triangle is composed of straight lines. However, straight lines never enter our mind via the senses, since when we examine straight lines under a magnifying lens, they turn out to be wavy or irregular in some way. Since we cannot derive the idea of straight lines from the senses, we cannot derive the idea of a true triangle, which is made up of straight lines, through the senses. Sometimes Descartes makes the point in slightly different terms by insisting that there is “no similarity” between the corporeal motions of the sense organs and the ideas formed in the mind on the occasion of those motions (CSM I, 304; CSMK III, 187). One such dissimilarity, which is particularly striking, is the contrast between the particularity of all corporeal motions and the universality that pure ideas can attain when conjoined to form necessary truths. Descartes makes this point in clear terms to Regius:

I would like our author to tell me what the corporeal motion is that is capable of forming some common notion to the effect that ‘things which are equal to a third thing are equal to each other,’ or any other he cares to take. For all such motions are particular, whereas the common notions are universal and bear no affinity with, or relation to, the motions. (CSM I, 304-5)

Next, Descartes has to show that the idea of a triangle is not factitious. This is where the doctrine of “true and immutable natures” comes in. For Descartes, if, for example, the idea that the three angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles were his own invention, it would be mutable, like the idea of a gold mountain, which can be changed at whim into the idea of a silver mountain. Instead, when Descartes thinks about his idea of a triangle, he is able to discover eternal properties of it that are not mutable in this way; hence, they are not invented (CSMK III, 184).

Since, therefore, the triangle can be neither adventitious nor factitious, it must be innate; that is to say, the mind has an innate tendency or power to form this idea from its own purely intellectual resources when prompted to do so.

Descartes’ insistence that there is no similarity between the corporeal motions of our sense organs and the ideas formed in the mind on the occasion of those motions raises a difficulty for understanding how any ideas could be adventitious. Since none of our ideas have any similarity to the corporeal motions of the sense organs – even the idea of motion itself – it seems that no ideas can in fact have their origin in a source external to the mind. The reason that we have an idea of heat in the presence of fire, for instance, is not, then, because the idea is somehow transmitted by the fire. Rather, Descartes thinks that God designed us in such a way that we form the idea of heat on the occasion of certain corporeal motions in our sense organs (and we form other sensory ideas on the occasion of other corporeal motions). Thus, there is a sense in which, for Descartes, all ideas are innate, and his tripartite division between kinds of ideas becomes difficult to maintain.

b. Spinoza

Per his so-called doctrine of “parallelism,” Spinoza conceives the mind and the body as one and the same thing, conceived under different attributes (to wit, thought and extension). (See Benedict de Spinoza: Metaphysics.) As a result, Spinoza denies that there is any causal interaction between mind and body, and so Spinoza denies that any ideas are caused by bodily change. Just as bodies can be affected only by other bodies, so ideas can be affected only by other ideas. This does not mean, however, that all ideas are innate for Spinoza, as they very clearly are for Leibniz (see below). Just as the body can be conceived to be affected by external objects conceived under the attribute of extension (that is, as bodies), so the mind can (as it were, in parallel) be conceived to be affected by the same objects conceived under the attribute of thought (that is, as ideas). Ideas gained in this way, from encounters with external objects (conceived as ideas) constitutes knowledge of the first kind, or “imagination,” for Spinoza, and all such ideas are “inadequate,” or in other words, confused and lacking order for the intellect. “Adequate ideas,” on the other hand, which can be formed via Spinoza’s second and third kinds of knowledge (reason and intuitive knowledge, respectively), and which are clear and distinct and have order for the intellect, are not gained through chance encounters with external objects; rather, adequate ideas can be explained in terms of resources intrinsic to the mind. (For more on Spinoza’s three kinds of knowledge and the distinction between adequate and inadequate ideas, see Benedict de Spinoza: Epistemology.)

The mind, for Spinoza, just by virtue of having ideas, which is its essence, has ideas of what Spinoza calls “common notions,” or in other words, those things which are “equally in the part and in the whole.” Examples of common notions include motion and rest, extension, and indeed God. Take extension for example. To think of any body – however small or however large – is to have a perfectly complete idea of extension. So, insofar as the mind has any idea of body (and, for Spinoza, the human mind is the idea of the human body, and so always has ideas of body), it has a perfectly adequate idea of extension. The same can be said for motion and rest. The same can also be said for God, except that God is not equally in the part and in the whole of extension only, but of all things. Spinoza treats these common notions as principles of reasoning. Anything that can be deduced on their basis is also adequate.

It is not clear if Spinoza’s common notions should be considered innate ideas. Spinoza speaks of active and passive ideas, and adequate and inadequate ideas. He associates the former with the intellect and the latter with the imagination, but “innate idea” is not an explicit category in Spinoza’s theory of ideas as it is in Descartes’ and also Leibniz’s. Common notions are not “in” the mind independent of the mind’s relation with its object (the body); nevertheless, since it is the mind’s nature to be the idea of the body, it is part of the mind’s nature to have common notions. Commentators differ over the question of whether Spinoza had a positive doctrine of innate ideas; it is clear, however, that he denied that all ideas come about through encounters with external objects; moreover, he believed that those ideas which do come about through encounters with external objects are of an inferior epistemic value than those produced through the mind’s own intrinsic resources; this is enough to put him in the rationalist camp on the question of the origin of ideas.

c. Leibniz

Of the three great rationalists, Leibniz propounded the most thoroughgoing doctrine of innate ideas. For Leibniz, all ideas are strictly speaking innate. In a general and relatively straightforward sense, this viewpoint is a direct consequence of Leibniz’s conception of individual substance. According to Leibniz, “each substance is a world apart, independent of everything outside of itself except for God. Thus all our phenomena, that is to say, all the things that can ever happen to us, are only the results of our own being” (L, 312); or, in Leibniz’s famous phrase from the Monadology, “monads have no windows,” meaning there is no way for sensory data to enter monads from the outside. In this more general sense, then, to give an explanation for Leibniz’s doctrine of innate ideas would be to explain his conception of individual substance and the arguments and considerations which motivate it. (See Section 4, b, iii, below for a discussion of Leibniz’s conception of substance; see also Gottfried Leibniz: Metaphysics.) This would be to circumvent the issues and questions which are typically at the heart of the debate over the existence of innate ideas, which concern the extent to which certain kinds of perceptions, ideas, and propositions can be accounted for on the basis of experience. Although Leibniz’s more general reasons for embracing innate ideas stem from his unique brand of substance metaphysics, Leibniz does enter into the debate over innate ideas, as it were, addressing the more specific questions regarding the source of given kinds of ideas, most notably in his dialogic engagement with Locke’s philosophy, New Essays on Human Understanding.

Due to Leibniz’s conception of individual substance, nothing actually comes from a sensory experience, where a sensory experience is understood to involve direct concourse with things outside of the mind. However, Leibniz does have a means for distinguishing between sensations and purely intellectual thoughts within the framework of his substance metaphysics. For Leibniz, although each monad or individual substance “expresses” (or represents) the entire universe from its own unique point of view, it does so with a greater or lesser degree of clarity and distinctness. Bare monads, such as comprise minerals and vegetation, express the rest of the world only in the most confused fashion. Rational minds, by contrast, have a much greater proportion of clear and distinct perceptions, and so express more of the world clearly and distinctly than do bare monads. When an individual substance attains a more perfect expression of the world (in the sense that it attains a less confused expression of the world), it is said to act; when its expression becomes more confused, it is said to be acted upon. Using this distinction, Leibniz is able to reconcile the terms of his philosophy with everyday conceptions. Although, strictly speaking, no monad is acted upon by any other, nor acts upon any other directly, it is possible to speak this way, just as, Leibniz says, Copernicans can still speak of the motion of the sun for everyday purposes, while understanding that the sun does not in fact move. It is in this sense that Leibniz enters into the debate concerning the origin of our ideas.

Leibniz distinguishes between “ideas” (idées) and “thoughts” (pensées) (or, sometimes, “notions” (notions) or “concepts” (conceptus)). Ideas exist in the soul whether we actually perceive them or are aware of them or not. It is these “ideas” that Leibniz contends are innate. “Thoughts,” by contrast is Leibniz’s designation for ideas which we actually form or conceive at any given time. In this sense, “thoughts” can be formed on the basis of a sensory experience (with the above caveats regarding the meaning a sensory experience can have in Leibniz’s thought) or on the basis of an internal experience, or a reflection. Leibniz alternatively characterizes our “ideas” as “aptitudes,” “preformations,” and as “dispositions” to represent something when the occasion for thinking of it arises. On multiple occasions, Leibniz uses the metaphor of the veins present in marble to illustrate his understanding of innate ideas. Just as the veins dispose the sculptor to shape the marble in certain ways, so do our ideas dispose us to have certain thoughts on the occasion of certain experiences.

Leibniz rejects the view that the mind cannot have ideas without being aware that it has them. (See Gottfried Leibniz: Philosophy of Mind.) Much of the disagreement between Locke and Leibniz on the question of innate ideas turns on this point, since Locke (at least as Leibniz represents him in the New Essays) is not able to make any sense out of the notion that the mind can have ideas without being aware of them. Much of Leibniz’s defense of his innate ideas doctrine takes the form of replying to Locke’s charge that it is absurd to hold that the mind could think (that is, have ideas) without being aware of it.

Leibniz marshals several considerations in support of his view that the mind is not always aware of its ideas. The fact that we can store many more ideas in our understanding than we can be aware of at any given time is one. Leibniz also points to the phenomenology of attention; we do not attend to everything in our perceptual field at any given time; rather we focus on certain things at the expense of others. To convey a sense of what it might be like for the mind to have perceptions and ideas in a dreamless sleep, Leibniz asks the reader to imagine subtracting our attention from perceptual experience; since we can distinguish between what is attended to and what is not, subtracting attention does not eliminate perception altogether.

While such considerations suggest the possibility of innate ideas, they do not in and of themselves prove that innate ideas are necessary to explain the full scope of human cognition. The empiricist tends to think that if innate ideas are not necessary to explain cognition, then they should be abandoned as gratuitous metaphysical constructs. Leibniz does have arguments designed to show that innate ideas are needed for a full account of human cognition.

In the first place, Leibniz recalls favorably the famous scenario from Plato’s Meno where Socrates teaches a slave boy to grasp abstract mathematical truths merely by asking questions. The anecdote is supposed to indicate that mathematical truths can be generated by the mind alone, in the absence of particular sensory experiences, if only the mind is prompted to discover what it contains within itself. Concerning mathematics and geometry, Leibniz remarks: “one could construct these sciences in one’s study and even with one’s eyes closed, without learning from sight or even from touch any of the needed truths” (NE, 77). So, on these grounds, Leibniz contends that without innate ideas, we could not explain the sorts of cognitive capacities exhibited in the mathematical sciences.

A second argument concerns our capacity to grasp certain necessary or eternal truths. Leibniz says that necessary truths can be suggested, justified, and confirmed by experience, but that they can be proved only by the understanding alone (NE, 80). Leibniz does not explain this point further, but he seems to have in mind the point later made by both Hume and Kant (to different ends), that experience on its own can never account for the kind of certainty that we find in mathematical and metaphysical truths. For Leibniz, if it can be granted that we can be certain of propositions in mathematics and metaphysics – and Leibniz thinks this must be granted – recourse must be had to principles innate to the mind in order to explain our ability to be certain of such things.

d. Malebranche

It is worth noting briefly the position of Nicolas Malebranche on innate ideas, since Malebranche is often considered among the rationalists, yet he denied the doctrine of innate ideas. Malebranche’s reasons for rejecting innate ideas were anything but empiricist in nature, however. His leading objection stems from the infinity of ideas that the mind is able to form independently of the senses; as an example, Malebranche cites the infinite number of triangles of which the mind could in principle, albeit not in practice, form ideas. Unlike Descartes and Leibniz, who view innate ideas as tendencies or dispositions to form certain thoughts under certain circumstances, Malebranche understands them as fully formed entities that would have to exist somehow in the mind were they to exist there innately. Given this conception, Malebranche finds it unlikely that God would have created “so many things along with the mind of man” (The Search After Truth, p. 227). Since God already contains the ideas of all things within Himself, Malebranche thinks that it would be much more economical if God were simply to reveal to us the ideas of things that already exist in him rather than placing an infinity of ideas in each human mind. Malebranche’s tenet that “we see all things in God” thus follows upon the principle that God always acts in the simplest ways. Malebranche finds further support for this doctrine from the fact that it places human minds in a position of complete dependence on God. Thus, if Malebranche’s rejection of innate ideas distinguishes him from other rationalists, it does so not from an empiricist standpoint, but rather because of the extent to which his position on ideas is theologically motivated.

3. Mathematical Method

In one sense, what it means to be a rationalist is to model philosophy on mathematics, and, in particular, geometry. This means that the rationalist begins with definitions and intuitively self-evident axioms and proceeds thence to deduce a philosophical system of knowledge that is both certain and complete. This at least is the goal and (with some qualifications to be explored below) the claim. In no work of rationalist philosophy is this procedure more apparent than in Spinoza’s Ethics, laid out famously in the geometrical manner (more geometrico). Nevertheless, Descartes’ main works (and those of Leibniz as well), although not as overtly more geometrico as Spinoza’s Ethics, are also modelled after geometry, and it is Descartes’ celebrated methodological program that first introduces mathematics as a model for philosophy.

a. Descartes

Perhaps Descartes’ clearest and most well-known statement of mathematics’ role as paradigm appears in the Discourse on the Method:

Those long chains of very simple and easy reasonings, which geometers customarily use to arrive at their most difficult demonstrations, had given me occasion to suppose that all the things which can fall under human knowledge are interconnected in the same way. (CSM I, 120)

However, Descartes’ promotion of mathematics as a model for philosophy dates back to his early, unfinished work, Rules for the Direction of the Mind. It is in this work that Descartes first outlines his standards for certainty that have since come to be so closely associated with him and with the rationalist enterprise more generally.

In Rule 2, Descartes declares that henceforth only what is certain should be valued and counted as knowledge. This means the rejection of all merely probable reasoning, which Descartes associates with the philosophy of the Schools. Descartes admits that according to this criterion, only arithmetic and geometry thus far count as knowledge. But Descartes does not conclude that only in these disciplines is it possible to attain knowledge. According to Descartes, the reason that certainty has eluded philosophers has as much to do with the disdain that philosophers have for the simplest truths as it does with the subject matter. Admittedly, the objects of arithmetic and geometry are especially pure and simple, or, as Descartes will later say, “clear and distinct.” Nevertheless, certainty can be attained in philosophy as well, provided the right method is followed.

Descartes distinguishes between two ways of achieving knowledge: “through experience and through deduction […] [W]e must note that while our experiences of things are often deceptive, the deduction or pure inference of one thing from another can never be performed wrongly by an intellect which is in the least degree rational […]” (CSM I, 12). This is a clear statement of Descartes’ methodological rationalism. Building up knowledge through accumulated experience can only ever lead to the sort of probable knowledge that Descartes finds lacking. “Pure inference,” by contrast,” can never go astray, at least when it is conducted by right reason. Of course, the truth value of a deductive chain is only as good as the first truths, or axioms, whose truth the deductions preserve. It is for this reason that Descartes’ method relies on intuition as well as deduction. Intuition provides the first principles of a deductive system, for Descartes. Intuition differs from deduction insofar as it is not discursive. Intuition grasps its object in an immediate way. In its broadest outlines, Descartes’ method is just the use of intuition and deduction in the orderly attainment and preservation of certainty.

In subsequent Rules, Descartes goes on to elaborate a more specific methodological program, which involves reducing complicated matters step by step to simpler, intuitively graspable truths, and then using those simple truths as principles from which to deduce knowledge of more complicated matters. It is generally accepted by scholars that this more specific methodological program reappears in a more iconic form in the Discourse on the Method as the four rules for gaining knowledge outlined in Part 2. There is some doubt as to the extent to which this more specific methodological program actually plays any role in Descartes’ mature philosophy as it is expressed in the Meditations and Principles (see Garber 2001, chapter 2). There can be no doubt, however, that the broader methodological guidelines outlined above were a permanent feature of Descartes’ thought.

In response to a request to cast his Meditations in the geometrical style (that is, in the style of Euclid’s Elements), Descartes distinguishes between two aspects of the geometrical style: order and method, explaining:

The order consists simply in this. The items which are put forward first must be known entirely without the aid of what comes later; and the remaining items must be arranged in such a way that their demonstration depends solely on what has gone before. I did try to follow this order very carefully in my Meditations […] (CSM II, 110)

Elsewhere, Descartes contrasts this order, which he calls the “order of reasons,” with another order, which he associates with scholasticism, and which he calls the “order of subject-matter” (see CSMK III, 163). What Descartes understands as “geometrical order” or the “order of reasons” is just the procedure of starting with what is most simple, and proceeding in a step-wise, deliberate fashion to deduce consequences from there. Descartes’ order is governed by what can be clearly and distinctly intuited, and by what can be clearly and distinctly inferred from such self-evident intuitions (rather than by a concern for organizing the discussion into neat topical categories per the order of subject-matter)

As for method, Descartes distinguishes between analysis and synthesis. For Descartes, analysis and synthesis represent different methods of demonstrating a conclusion or set of conclusions. Analysis exhibits the path by which the conclusion comes to be grasped. As such, it can be thought of as the order of discovery or order of knowledge. Synthesis, by contrast, wherein conclusions are deduced from a series of definitions, postulates, and axioms, as in Euclid’s Elements, for instance, follows not the order in which things are discovered, but rather the order that things bear to one another in reality. As such, it can be thought of as the order of being. God, for example, is prior to the human mind in the order of being (since God created the human mind), and so in the synthetic mode of demonstration the existence of God is demonstrated before the existence of the human mind. However, knowledge of one’s own mind precedes knowledge of God, at least in Descartes’ philosophy, and so in the analytic mode of demonstration the cogito is demonstrated before the existence of God. Descartes’ preference is for analysis, because he thinks that it is superior in helping the reader to discover the things for herself, and so in bringing about the intellectual conversion which it is the Meditations’ goal to effectuate in the minds of its readers. According to Descartes, while synthesis, in laying out demonstrations systematically, is useful in preempting dissent, it is inferior in engaging the mind of the reader.

Two primary distinctions can be made in summarizing Descartes’ methodology: (1) the distinction between the order of reasons and the order of subject-matter; and (2) the analysis/synthesis distinction. With respect to the first distinction, the great Continental rationalists are united. All adhere to the order of reasons, as we have described it above, rather than the order of subject-matter. Even though the rationalists disagree about how exactly to interpret the content of the order of reasons, their common commitment to following an order of reasons is a hallmark of their rationalism. Although there are points of convergence with respect to the second, analysis/synthesis distinction, there are also clear points of divergence, and this distinction can be useful in highlighting the range of approaches the rationalists adopt to mathematical methodology.

b. Spinoza

Of the great Continental rationalists, Spinoza is the most closely associated with mathematical method due to the striking presentation of his magnum opus, the Ethics, (as well as his presentation of Descartes’ Principles), in geometrical fashion. The fact that Spinoza is the only major rationalist to present his main work more geometrico might create the impression that he is the only philosopher to employ mathematical method in constructing and elaborating his philosophical system. This impression is mistaken, since both Descartes and Leibniz also apply mathematical method to philosophy. Nevertheless, there are differences between Spinoza’s employment of mathematical method and that of Descartes (and Leibniz). The most striking, of course, is the form of Spinoza’s Ethics. Each part begins with a series of definitions, axioms, and postulates and proceeds thence to deduce propositions, the demonstrations of which refer back to the definitions, axioms, postulates and previously demonstrated propositions on which they depend. Of course, this is just the method of presenting findings that Descartes in the Second Replies dubbed “synthesis.” For Descartes, analysis and synthesis differ only in pedagogical respects: whereas analysis is better for helping the reader discover the truth for herself, synthesis is better in compelling agreement.

There is some evidence that Spinoza’s motivations for employing synthesis were in part pedagogical. In Lodewijk Meyer’s preface to Spinoza’s Principles of Cartesian Philosophy, Meyer uses Descartes’ Second Replies distinction between analysis and synthesis to explain the motivation for the work. Meyer criticizes Descartes’ followers for being too uncritical in their enthusiasm for Descartes’ thought, and attributes this in part to the relative opacity of Descartes’ analytic mode of presentation. Thus, for Meyer, the motivation for presenting Descartes’ Principles in the synthetic manner is to make the proofs more transparent, and thereby leave less excuse for blind acceptance of Descartes’ conclusions. It is not clear to what extent Meyer’s explanation of the mode of presentation of Spinoza’s Principles of Cartesian Philosophy applies to Spinoza’s Ethics. In the first place, although Spinoza approved the preface, he did not author it himself. Secondly, while such an explanation seems especially suited to a work in which Spinoza’s chief goal was to present another philosopher’s thought in a different form, there is no reason to assume that it applies to the presentation of Spinoza’s own philosophy. Scholars have differed on how to interpret the geometrical form of Spinoza’s Ethics. However, it is generally accepted that Spinoza’s use of synthesis does not merely represent a pedagogical preference. There is reason to think that Spinoza’s methodology differs from that of Descartes in a somewhat deeper way.

There is another version of the analysis/synthesis distinction besides Descartes’ that was also influential in the 17th century, that is, Hobbes’ version of the distinction. Although there is little direct evidence that Spinoza was influenced by Hobbes’ version of the distinction, some scholars have claimed a connection, and, in any case, it is useful to view Spinoza’s methodology in light of the Hobbesian alternative.

Synthesis and analysis are not modes of demonstrating findings that have already been made, for Hobbes, as they are for Descartes, but rather complementary means of generating findings; in particular, they are forms of causal reasoning. For Hobbes, analysis is reasoning from effects to causes; synthesis is reasoning in the other direction, from causes to effects. For example, by analysis, we infer that geometrical objects are constructed via the motions of points and lines and surfaces. Once motion has been established as the principle of geometry, it is then possible, via synthesis, to construct the possible effects of motion, and thereby, to make new discoveries in geometry. According to the Hobbesian schema, then, synthesis is not merely a mode of presenting truths, but a means of generating and discovering truths. (For Hobbes’ method, see The English Works of Thomas Hobbes of Malmesbury, vol. 1, ch. 6.) There is reason to think that synthesis had this kind of significance for Spinoza, as well – as a means of discovery, not merely presentation. Spinoza’s methodology, and, in particular, his theory of definitions, bear this out

Spinoza’s method begins with reflection on the nature of a “given true idea.” The “given true idea” serves as a standard by which the mind learns the distinction between true and false ideas, and also between the intellect and the imagination, and how to direct itself properly in the discovery of true ideas. The correct formulation of definitions emerges as the most important factor in directing the mind properly in the discovery of true ideas. To illustrate his conception of a good definition, Spinoza contrasts two definitions of a circle. On one definition, a circle is a figure in which all the lines from the center to the circumference are equal. On another, a circle is the figure described by the rotation of a line around one of its ends, which is fixed. For Spinoza, the second definition is superior. Whereas the first definition gives only a property of the circle, the second provides the cause from which all of the properties can be deduced. Hence, what makes a definition a good definition, for Spinoza, is its capacity to serve as a basis for the discovery of truths about the thing. The circle, of course, is just an example. For Spinoza, the method is perfected when it arrives at a true idea of the first cause of all things, that is, God. Only the method is perfected with a true idea of God, however, not the philosophy. The philosophy itself begins with a true idea of God, since the philosophy consists in deducing the consequences from a true idea of God. With this in mind, the definition of God is of paramount importance. In correspondence, Spinoza compares contrasting definitions of God, explaining that he chose the one which expresses the efficient cause from which all of the properties of God can be deduced.

In this light, it becomes clear that the geometrical presentation of Spinoza’s philosophy is not merely a pedagogic preference. The definitions that appear at the outset of the five parts of the Ethics do not serve merely to make explicit what might otherwise have remained only implicit in Descartes’ analytic mode of presentation. Rather, key definitions, such as the definition of God, are principles that underwrite the development of the system. As a result, Hobbes’ conception of the analysis/synthesis distinction throws an important light on Spinoza’s procedure. There is a movement of analysis in arriving at the causal definition of God from the preliminary “given true idea.” Then there is a movement of synthesis in deducing consequences from that causal definition. Of course, Descartes’ analysis/synthesis distinction still applies, since, after all, Spinoza’s system is presented in the synthetic manner in the Ethics. But the geometrical style of presentation is not merely a pedagogical device in Spinoza’s case. It is also a clue to the nature of his system.

c. Leibniz

Leibniz is openly critical of Descartes’ distinction between analysis and synthesis, writing, “Those who think that the analytic presentation consists in revealing the origin of a discovery, the synthetic in keeping it concealed, are in error” (L, 233). This comment is aimed at Descartes’ formulation of the distinction in the Second Replies. Leibniz is explicit about his adherence to the viewpoint that seems to be implied by Spinoza’s methodology: synthesis is itself a means of discovering truth no less than analysis, not merely a mode of presentation. Leibniz’s understanding of analysis and synthesis is closer to the Hobbesian conception, which views analysis and synthesis as different directions of causal reasoning: from effects to causes (analysis) and from causes to effects (synthesis). Leibniz formulates the distinction in his own terms as follows:

Synthesis is achieved when we begin from principles and run through truths in good order, thus discovering certain progressions and setting up tables, or sometimes general formulas, in which the answers to emerging questions can later be discovered. Analysis goes back to the principles in order to solve the given problems only […] (L, 232)

Leibniz thus conceives synthesis and analysis in relation to principles.

Leibniz lays great stress on the importance of establishing the possibility of ideas, that is to say, establishing that ideas do not involve contradiction, and this applies a fortiori to first principles. For Leibniz, the Cartesian criterion of clear and distinct perception does not suffice for establishing the possibility of an idea. Leibniz is critical, in particular, of Descartes’ ontological argument on the grounds that Descartes neglects to demonstrate the possibility of the idea of a most perfect being on which the argument depends. It is possible to mistakenly assume that an idea is possible, when in reality it is contradictory. Leibniz gives the example of a wheel turning at the fastest possible rate. It might at first seem that this idea is legitimate, but if a spoke of the wheel were extended beyond the rim, the end of the spoke would move faster than a nail in the rim itself, revealing a contradiction in the original notion.

For Leibniz, there are two ways of establishing the possibility of an idea: by experience (a posteriori) and by reducing concepts via analysis down to a relation of identity (a priori). Leibniz credits mathematicians and geometers with pushing the practice of demonstrating what would otherwise normally be taken for granted the furthest. For example, in Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas, Leibniz writes, “That brilliant genius Pascal agrees entirely with these principles when he says, in his famous dissertation on the geometrical spirit […] that it is the task of the geometer to define all terms though ever so little obscure and to prove all truths though little doubtful” (L, 294). Leibniz credits his own doctrine of the possibility of ideas with clarifying exactly what it means for something to be beyond doubt and obscurity.

Leibniz describes the result of the reduction of concepts to identity variously as follows: when the thing is resolved into simple primitive notions understood in themselves (L, 231); “when every ingredient that enters into a distinct concept is itself known distinctly”; “when analysis is carried through to the end” (L, 292). Since, for Leibniz, all true ideas can be reduced to simple identities, it is, in principle, possible to derive all truths via a movement of synthesis from such simple identities in the way that mathematicians produce systems of knowledge on the basis of their basic definitions and axioms. This kind of a priori knowledge of the world is restricted to God, however. According to Leibniz, it is only possible for our finite minds to have this kind of knowledge – which Leibniz calls “intuitive” or “adequate” – in the case of things which do not depend on experience, or what Leibniz also calls “truths of reason,” which include abstract logical and metaphysical truths, and mathematical propositions. In the case of “truths of fact,” by contrast, with the exception of immediately graspable facts of experience, such as, “I think,” and “Various things are thought by me,” we are restricted to formulating hypotheses to explain the phenomena of sensory experience, and such knowledge of the world can, for us, only ever achieve the status of hypothesis, though our hypothetical knowledge can be continually improved and refined. (See Section 5, c, below for a discussion of hypotheses in Leibniz.)

Leibniz is in line with his rationalist predecessors in emphasizing the importance of proper order in philosophizing. Leibniz’s emphasis on establishing the possibility of ideas prior to using them in demonstrating propositions could be understood as a refinement of the geometrical order that Descartes established over against the order of subject-matter. Leibniz emphasizes order in another connection vis-à-vis Locke. As Leibniz makes clear in his New Essays, one of the clearest points of disagreement between him and Locke is on the question of innate ideas. In preliminary comments that Leibniz drew up upon first reading Locke’s Essay, and which he sent to Locke via Burnett, Leibniz makes the following point regarding philosophical order:

Concerning the question whether there are ideas and truths born with us, I do not find it absolutely necessary for the beginnings, nor for the practice of the art of thinking, to answer it; whether they all come to us from outside, or they come from within us, we will reason correctly provided that we keep in mind what I said above, and that we proceed with order and without prejudice. The question of the origin of our ideas and of our maxims is not preliminary in philosophy, and it is necessary to have made great progress in order to resolve it. (Philosophische Schriften, vol. 5, pp. 15-16)

Leibniz’s allusion to what he “said above” refers to remarks regarding the establishment of the possibility of ideas via experience and the principle of identity. This passage makes it clear that, from Leibniz’s point of view, the order in which Locke philosophizes is quite misguided, since Locke begins with a question that should only be addressed after “great progress” has already been made, particularly with respect to the criteria for distinguishing between true and false ideas, and for establishing legitimate philosophical principles. Empiricists generally put much less emphasis on the order of philosophizing, since they do not aim to reason from first principles grasped a priori.

4. A Priori Principles

A fundamental tenet of rationalism – perhaps the fundamental tenet – is that the world is intelligible. The intelligibility tenet means that everything that happens in the world happens in an orderly, lawful, rational manner, and that the mind, in principle, if not always in practice, is able to reproduce the interconnections of things in thought provided that it adheres to certain rules of right reasoning. The intelligibility of the world is sometimes couched in terms of a denial of brute facts, where a “brute fact” is something that “just is the case,” that is, something that obtains without any reason or explanation (even in principle). Many of the a priori principles associated with rationalism can be understood either as versions or implications of the principle of intelligibility. As such, the principle of intelligibility functions as a basic principle of rationalism. It appears under various guises in the great rationalist systems and is used to generate contrasting philosophical systems. Indeed, one of the chief criticisms of rationalism is the fact that its principles can consistently be used to generate contradictory conclusions and systems of thought. The clearest and best known statement of the intelligibility of the world is Leibniz’s principle of sufficient reason. Some scholars have recently emphasized this principle as the key to understanding rationalism (see Della Rocca 2008, chapter 1).

The intelligibility principle raises some classic philosophical problems. Chief among these is a problem of question-begging or circularity. The task of proving that the world is intelligible seems to have to rely on some of the very principles of reasoning in question. In the 17th century, discussion of this fundamental problem centered around the so-called “Cartesian circle.” The problem is still debated by scholars of 17th century thought today. The viability of the rationalist enterprise seems to depend, at least in part, on a satisfactory answer to this problem.

a. Intelligibility and the Cartesian Circle

The most important rational principle in Descartes’ philosophy, the principle which does a great deal of the work in generating its details, is the principle according to which whatever is clearly and distinctly perceived to be true is true. This principle means that if we can form any clear and distinct ideas, then we will be able to trust that they accurately represent their objects, and give us certain knowledge of reality. Descartes’ clear and distinct ideas doctrine is central to his conception of the world’s intelligibility, and indeed, it is central to the rationalists’ conception of the world’s intelligibility more broadly. Although Spinoza and Leibniz both work to refine understanding of what it is to have clear and distinct ideas, they both subscribe to the view that the mind, when directed properly, is able to accurately represent certain basic features of reality, such as the nature of substance.

For Descartes, it cannot be taken for granted from the outset that what we clearly and distinctly perceive to be true is in fact true. It is possible to entertain the doubt that an all-powerful deceiving being fashioned the mind so that it is deceived even in those things it perceives clearly and distinctly. Nevertheless, it is only possible to entertain this doubt when we are not having clear and distinct perceptions. When we are perceiving things clearly and distinctly, their truth is undeniable. Moreover, we can use our capacity for clear and distinct perceptions to demonstrate that the mind was not fashioned by an all-powerful deceiving being, but rather by an all-powerful benevolent being who would not fashion us so as to be deceived even when using our minds properly. Having proved the existence of an all-powerful benevolent being qua creator of our minds, we can no longer entertain any doubts regarding our clear and distinct ideas even when we are not presently engaged in clear and distinct perceptions.

Descartes’ legitimation of clear and distinct perception via his proof of a benevolent God raises notorious interpretive challenges. Scholars disagree about how to resolve the problem of the “Cartesian circle.” However, there is general consensus that Descartes’ procedure is not, in fact, guilty of vicious, logical circularity. In order for Descartes’ procedure to avoid circularity, it is generally agreed that in some sense clear and distinct ideas need already to be legitimate before the proof of God’s existence. It is only in another sense that God’s existence legitimates their truth. Scholars disagree on how exactly to understand those different senses, but they generally agree that there is some sense at least in which clear and distinct ideas are self-legitimating, or, otherwise, not in need of legitimation.

That some ideas provide a basic standard of truth is a fundamental tenet of rationalism, and undergirds all the other rationalist principles at work in the construction of rationalist systems of philosophy. For the rationalists, if it cannot be taken for granted in at least some sense from the outset that the mind is capable of discerning the difference between truth and falsehood, then one never gets beyond skepticism.

b. Substance Metaphysics

The Continental rationalists deploy the principle of intelligibility and subordinate rational principles derived from it in generating much of the content of their respective philosophical systems. In no aspect of their systems is the application of rational principles to the generation of philosophical content more evident and more clearly illustrative of contrasting interpretations of these principles than in that for which the Continental rationalists are arguably best known: substance metaphysics.

i. Descartes

Descartes deploys his clear and distinct ideas doctrine in justifying his most well-known metaphysical position: substance dualism. The first step in Descartes’ demonstration of mind-body dualism, or, in his terminology, of a “real” distinction (that is, a distinction between two substances) between mind and body is to show that while it is possible to doubt that one has a body, it is not possible to doubt that one is thinking. As Descartes makes clear in the Principles of Philosophy, one of the chief upshots of his famous cogito argument is the discovery of the distinction between a thinking thing and a corporeal thing. The impossibility of doubting one’s existence is not the impossibility of doubting that one is a human being with a body with arms and legs and a head. It is the impossibility of doubting, rather, that one doubts, perceives, dreams, imagines, understands, wills, denies, and other modalities that Descartes attributes to the thinking thing. It is possible to think of oneself as a thing that thinks, and to recognize that it is impossible to doubt that one thinks, while continuing to doubt that one has a body with arms and legs and a head. So, the cogito drives a preliminary wedge between mind and body.

At this stage of the argument, however, Descartes has simply established that it is possible to conceive of himself as a thinking thing without conceiving of himself as a corporeal thing. It remains possible that, in fact, the thinking thing is identical with a corporeal thing, in other words, that thought is somehow something a body can do; Descartes has yet to establish that the epistemological distinction between his knowledge of his mind and his knowledge of body that results from the hyperbolic doubt translates to a metaphysical or ontological distinction between mind and body. The move from the epistemological distinction to the ontological distinction proceeds via the doctrine of clear and distinct ideas. Having established that whatever he clearly and distinctly perceives is true, Descartes is in a position to affirm the real distinction between mind and body.

In this life, it is never possible to clearly and distinctly perceive a mind actually separate from a body, at least in the case of finite, created minds, because minds and bodies are intimately unified in the composite human being. So Descartes cannot base his proof for the real distinction of mind and body on the clear and distinct perception that mind and body are in fact independently existing things. Rather, Descartes’ argument is based on the joint claims that (1) it is possible to have a clear and distinct idea of thought apart from extension and vice versa; and (2) whatever we can clearly and distinctly understand is capable of being created by God exactly as we clearly and distinctly understand it. Thus, the fact that we can clearly and distinctly understand thought apart from extension and vice versa entails that thinking things and extended things are “really” distinct (in the sense that they are distinct substances separable by God).

The foregoing argument relies on certain background assumptions which it is now necessary to explain, in particular, Descartes’ conception of substance. In the Principles, Descartes defines substance as “a thing which exists in such a way as to depend on no other thing for its existence” (CSM I, 210). Properly speaking, only God can be understood to depend on no other thing, and so only God is a substance in the absolute sense. Nevertheless, Descartes allows that, in a relative sense, created things can count as substances too. A created thing is a substance if the only thing it relies upon for its existence is “the ordinary concurrence of God” (ibid.). Only mind and body qualify as substances in this secondary sense. Everything else is a modification or property of minds and bodies. A second point is that, for Descartes, we do not have a direct knowledge of substance; rather, we come to know substance by virtue of its attributes. Thought and extension are the attributes or properties in virtue of which we come to know thinking and corporeal substance, or “mind” and “body.” This point relies on the application of a key rational principle, to wit, nothingness has no properties. For Descartes, there cannot simply be the properties of thinking and extension without these properties having something in which to inhere. Thinking and extension are not just any properties; Descartes calls them “principal attributes” because they constitute the nature of their respective substances. Other, non-essential properties, cannot be understood without the principal attribute, but the principal attribute can be understood without any of the non-essential properties. For example, motion cannot be understood without extension, but extension can be understood without motion.

Descartes’ conception of mind and body as distinct substances includes some interesting corollaries which result from a characteristic application of rational principles and account for some characteristic doctrinal differences between Descartes and empiricist philosophers. One consequence of Descartes’ conception of the mind as a substance whose principal attribute is thought is that the mind must always be thinking. Since, for Descartes, thinking is something of which the thinker is necessarily aware, Descartes’ commitment to thought as an essential, and therefore, inseparable, property of the mind raises some awkward difficulties. Arnauld, for example, raises one such difficulty in his Objections to Descartes’ Meditations: presumably there is much going on in the mind of an infant in its mother’s womb of which the infant is not aware. In response to this objection, and also in response to another obvious problem, that is, that of dreamless sleep, Descartes insists on a distinction between being aware of or conscious of our thoughts at the time we are thinking them, and remembering them afterwards (CSMK III, 357). The infant is, in fact, aware of its thinking in the mother’s womb, but it is aware only of very confused sensory thoughts of pain and pleasure and heat (not, as Descartes points out, metaphysical matters (CSMK III, 189)) which it does not remember afterwards. Similarly, the mind is always thinking even in the most “dreamless sleep,” it is just that the mind often immediately forgets much of what it had been aware.

Descartes’ commitment to embracing the implications – however counter-intuitive – of his substance-attribute metaphysics, puts him at odds with, for instance, Locke, who mocks the Cartesian doctrine of the always-thinking soul in his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. For Locke, the question whether the soul is always thinking or not must be decided by experience and not, as Locke says, merely by “hypothesis” (An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Book II, Chapter 1). The evidence of dreamless sleep makes it obvious, for Locke, that the soul is not always thinking. Because Locke ties personal identity to memory, if the soul were to think while asleep without knowing it, the sleeping man and the waking man would be two different persons.

Descartes’ commitment to the always-thinking mind is a consequence of his commitment to a more basic rational principle. In establishing his conception of thinking substance, Descartes reasons from the attribute of thinking to the substance of thinking on the grounds that nothing has no properties. In this case, he reasons in the other direction, from the substance of thinking, that is, the mind, to the property of thinking on the converse grounds that something must have properties, and the properties it must have are the properties that make it what it is; in the case of the mind, that property is thought. (Leibniz found a way to maintain the integrity of the rational principle without contradicting experience: admit that thinking need not be conscious. This way the mind can still think in a dreamless sleep, and so avoid being without any properties, without any problem about the recollection of awareness.)

Another consequence of Descartes’ substance metaphysics concerns corporeal substance. For Descartes, we do not know corporeal substance directly, but rather through a grasp of its principal attribute, extension. Extension qua property requires a substance in which to inhere because of the rational principle, nothing has no properties. This rational principle leads to another characteristic Cartesian position regarding the material world: the denial of a vacuum. Descartes denies that space can be empty or void. Space has the property of being extended in length, breadth, and depth, and such properties require a substance in which to inhere. Thus, nothing, that is, a void or vacuum, is not able to have such properties because of the rational principle, nothing has no properties. This means that all space is filled with substance, even if it is imperceptible. Once again, Descartes answers a debated philosophical question on the basis of a rational principle.

ii. Spinoza

If Descartes is known for his dualism, Spinoza, of course, is known for monism – the doctrine that there is only one substance. Spinoza’s argument for substance monism (laid out in the first fifteen propositions of the Ethics) has no essential basis in sensory experience; it proceeds through rational argumentation and the deployment of rational principles; although Spinoza provides one a posteriori argument for God’s existence, he makes clear that he presents it only because it is easier to grasp than the a priori arguments, and not because it is in any way necessary.

The crucial step in the argument for substance monism comes in Ethics 1p5: “In Nature there cannot be two or more substances of the same nature or attribute.” It is at this proposition that Descartes (and Leibniz, and many others) would part ways with Spinoza. The most striking and controversial implication of this proposition, at least from a Cartesian perspective, is that human minds cannot qualify as substances, since human minds all share the same nature or attribute, that is, thought. In Spinoza’s philosophy, human minds are actually themselves properties – Spinoza calls them “modes” – of a more basic, infinite substance.

The argument for 1p5 works as follows. If there were two or more distinct substances, there would have to be some way to distinguish between them. There are two possible distinctions to be made: either by a difference in their affections or by a difference in their attributes. For Spinoza, a substance is something which exists in itself and can be conceived through itself; an attribute is “what the intellect perceives of a substance, as constituting its essence” (Ethics 1d4). Spinoza’s conception of attributes is a matter of longstanding scholarly debate, but for present purposes, we can think of it along Cartesian lines. For Descartes, substance is always grasped through a principal property, which is the nature or essence of the substance. Spinoza agrees that an attribute is that through which the mind conceives the nature or essence of substance. With this in mind, if a distinction between two substances were to be made on the basis of a difference in attributes, then there would not be two substances of the same attribute as the proposition indicates. This means that if there were two substances of the same attribute, it would be necessary to distinguish between them on the basis of a difference in modes or affections.

Spinoza conceives of an affection or mode as something which exists in another and needs to be conceived through another. Given this conception of affections, it is impossible, for Spinoza, to distinguish between two substances on the basis of a difference in affections. Doing so would be somewhat akin to affirming that there are two apples on the basis of a difference between two colors, when one apple can quite possibly have a red part and a green part. As color differences do not per se determine differences between apples, in a similar way, modal differences cannot determine a difference between substances – you could just be dealing with one substance bearing multiple different affections. It is notable that in 1p5, Spinoza uses virtually the same substance-attribute schema as Descartes to deny a fundamental feature of Descartes’ system.

Having established 1p5, the next major step in Spinoza’s argument for substance monism is to establish the necessary existence and infinity of substance. For Spinoza, if things have nothing in common with each other, one cannot be the cause of the other. This thesis depends upon assumptions that lie at the heart of Spinoza’s rationalism. Something that has nothing in common with another thing cannot be the cause of the other thing because things that have nothing in common with one another cannot be understood through one another (Ethics 1a5). But, for Spinoza, effects should be able to be understood through causes. Indeed, what it is to understand something, for Spinoza, is to understand its cause. The order of knowledge, provided that the knowledge is genuine, or, as Spinoza says, “adequate,” must map onto the order of being, and vice versa. Thus, Spinoza’s claim that if things have nothing in common with one another, one cannot be the cause of the other, is an expression of Spinoza’s fundamental, rationalist commitment to the intelligibility of the world. Given this assumption, and given the fact that no two substances have anything in common with one another, since no two substances share the same nature or attribute, it follows that if a substance is to exist, it must exist as causa sui (self-caused); in other words, it must pertain to the essence of substance to exist. Moreover, Spinoza thinks that since there is nothing that has anything in common with a given substance, there is therefore nothing to limit the nature of a given substance, and so every substance will necessarily be infinite. This assertion depends on another deep-seated assumption of Spinoza’s philosophy: nothing limits itself, but everything by virtue of its very nature affirms its own nature and existence as much as possible.

At this stage, Spinoza has argued that substances of a single attribute exist necessarily and are necessarily infinite. The last major stage of the argument for substance monism is the transition from multiple substances of a single attribute to only one substance of infinite attributes. Scholars have expressed varying degrees of satisfaction with the lucidity of this transition. It seems to work as follows. It is possible to attribute many attributes to one substance. The more reality or being each thing has, the more attributes belong to it. Therefore, an absolutely infinite being is a being that consists of infinite attributes. Spinoza calls an absolutely infinite being or substance consisting of infinite attributes “God.” Spinoza gives four distinct arguments for God’s existence in Ethics 1p11. The first is commonly interpreted as Spinoza’s version of an ontological argument. It refers back to 1p7 where Spinoza proved that it pertains to the essence of substance to exist. The second argument is relevant to present purposes, since it turns on Spinoza’s version of the principle of sufficient reason: “For each thing there must be assigned a cause, or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence” (Ethics 1p11dem). But there can be no reason for God’s nonexistence for the same reasons that all substances are necessarily infinite: there is nothing outside of God that is able to limit Him, and nothing limits itself. Once again, Spinoza’s argument rests upon his assumption that things by nature affirm their own existence. The third argument is a posteriori, and the fourth pivots like the second on the assumption that things by nature affirm their own existence.

Having proven that a being consisting of infinite attributes exists, Spinoza’s argument for substance monism is nearly complete. It remains only to point out that no substance besides God can exist, because if it did, it would have to share at least one of God’s infinite attributes, which, by 1p5, is impossible. Everything that exists, then, is either an attribute or an affection of God.

iii. Leibniz

Leibniz’s universe consists of an infinity of monads or simple substances, and God. For Leibniz, the universe must be composed of monads or simple substances. His justification for this claim is relatively straightforward. There must be simples, because there are compounds, and compounds are just collections of simples. To be simple, for Leibniz, means to be without parts, and thus to be indivisible. For Leibniz, the simples or monads are the “true atoms of nature” (L, 643). However, “material atoms are contrary to reason” (L, 456). Manifold a priori considerations lead Leibniz to reject material atoms. In the first place, the notion of a material atom is contradictory in Leibniz’s view. Matter is extended, and that which is extended is divisible into parts. The very notion of an atom, however, is the notion of something indivisible, lacking parts.

From a different perspective, Leibniz’s dynamical investigations provide another argument against material atoms. Absolute rigidity is included in the notion of a material atom, since any elasticity in the atom could only be accounted for on the basis of parts within the atom shifting their position with respect to each other, which is contrary to the notion of a partless atom. According to Leibniz’s analysis of impact, however, absolute rigidity is shown not to make sense. Consider the rebound of one atom as a result of its collision with another. If the atoms were absolutely rigid, the change in motion resulting from the collision would have to happen instantaneously, or, as Leibniz says, “through a leap or in a moment” (L, 446). The atom would change from initial motion to rest to rebounded motion without passing through any intermediary degrees of motion. Since the body must pass through all the intermediary degrees of motion in transitioning from one state of motion to another, it must not be absolutely rigid, but rather elastic; the analysis of the parts of the body must, in correlation with the degree of motion, proceed to infinity. Leibniz’s dynamical argument against material atoms turns on what he calls the law of continuity, an a priori principle according to which “no change occurs through a leap.”

The true unities, or true atoms of nature, therefore, cannot be material; they must be spiritual or metaphysical substances akin to souls. Since Leibniz’s spiritual substances, or monads, are absolutely simple, without parts, they admit neither of dissolution nor composition. Moreover, there can be no interaction between monads, monads cannot receive impressions or undergo alterations by means of being affected from the outside, since, in Leibniz’s famous phrase from the Monadology, monads “have no windows” (L, 643). Monads must, however, have qualities, otherwise there would be no way to explain the changes we see in things and the diversity of nature. Indeed, following from Leibniz’s principle of the identity of indiscernibles, no two monads can be exactly alike, since each monad stands in a unique relation to the rest, and, for Leibniz, each monad’s relation to the rest is a distinctive feature of its nature. The way in which, for Leibniz, monads can have qualities while remaining simple, or in other words, the only way there can be multitude in simplicity is if monads are characterized and distinguished by means of their perceptions. Leibniz’s universe, in summary, consists in monads, simple spiritual substances, characterized and distinguished from one another by a unique series of perceptions determined by each monad’s unique relationship vis-à-vis the others.

Of the great rationalists, Leibniz is the most explicit about the principles of reasoning that govern his thought. Leibniz singles out two, in particular, as the most fundamental rational principles of his philosophy: the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason. According to the principle of contradiction, whatever involves a contradiction is false. According to the principle of sufficient reason, there is no fact or true proposition “without there being a sufficient reason for its being so and not otherwise” (L, 646). Corresponding to these two principles of reasoning are two kinds of truths: truths of reasoning and truths of fact. For Leibniz, truths of reasoning are necessary, and their opposite is impossible. Truths of fact, by contrast, are contingent, and their opposite is possible. Truths of reasoning are by most commentators associated with the principle of contradiction because they can be reduced via analysis to a relation between two primitive ideas, whose identity is intuitively evident. Thus, it is possible to grasp why it is impossible for truths of reasoning to be otherwise. However, this kind of resolution is only possible in the case of abstract propositions, such as the propositions of mathematics (see Section 3, c, above). Contingent truths, or truths of fact, by contrast, such as “Caesar crossed the Rubicon,” to use the example Leibniz gives in the Discourse on Metaphysics, are infinitely complicated. Although, for Leibniz, every predicate is contained in its subject, to reduce the relationship between Caesar’s “notion” and his action of crossing the Rubicon would require an infinite analysis impossible for finite minds. “Caesar crossed the Rubicon” is a contingent proposition, because there is another possible world in which Caesar did not cross the Rubicon. To understand the reason for Caesar’s crossing, then, entails understanding why this world exists rather than any other possible world. It is for this reason that contingent truths are associated with the principle of sufficient reason. Although the opposite of truths of fact is possible, there is nevertheless a sufficient reason why the fact is so and not otherwise, even though this reason cannot be known by finite minds.

Truths of fact, then, need to be explained; there must be a sufficient reason for them. However, according to Leibniz, “a sufficient reason for existence cannot be found merely in any one individual thing or even in the whole aggregate and series of things” (L, 486). That is to say, the sufficient reason for any given contingent fact cannot be found within the world of which it is a part. The sufficient reason must explain why this world exists rather than another possible world, and this reason must lie outside the world itself. For Leibniz, the ultimate reason for things must be contained in a necessary substance that creates the world, that is, God. But if the existence of God is to ground the series of contingent facts that make up the world, there must be a sufficient reason why God created this world rather than any of the other infinite possible worlds contained in his understanding. As a perfect being, God would only have chosen to bring this world into existence rather than any other because it is the best of all possible worlds. God’s choice, therefore, is governed by the principle of fitness, or what Leibniz also calls the “principle of the best” (L, 647). The best world, according to Leibniz, is the one which maximizes perfection; and the most perfect world is the one which balances the greatest possible variety with the greatest possible order. God achieves maximal perfection in the world through what Leibniz calls “the pre-established harmony.” Although the world is made up of an infinity of monads with no direct interaction with one another, God harmonizes the perceptions of each monad with the perceptions of every other monad, such that each monad represents a unique perspective on the rest of the universe according to its position vis-à-vis the others.

According to Leibniz’s philosophy, in the case of all true propositions, the predicate is contained in the subject. This is often known as the “predicate-in-notion principle. The relationship between predicate and subject can only be reduced to an identity relation in the case of truths of reason, whereas in the case of truths of fact, the reduction requires an infinite analysis. Nevertheless, in both cases, it is possible in principle (which is to say, for an infinite intellect) to know everything that will ever happen to an individual substance, and even everything that will happen in the world of an individual substance on the basis of an examination of the individual substance’s notion, since each substance is an expression of the entire world. Leibniz’s predicate-in-notion principle therefore unifies both of his two great principles of reasoning – the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason – since the relation between predicate and subject is either such that it is impossible for it to be otherwise or such that there is a sufficient reason why it is as it is and not otherwise. Moreover, it represents a particularly robust expression of the principle of intelligibility at the very heart of Leibniz’s system. There is a reason why everything is as it is, whether that reason is subject to finite or only to infinite analysis.

(See also: 17th Century Theories of Substance.)

5. Continental Rationalism, Experience, and Experiment

Rationalism is often criticized for placing too much confidence in the ability of reason alone to know the world. The extent to which one finds this criticism justified depends largely on one’s view of reason. For Hume, for instance, knowledge of the world of “matters of fact” is gained exclusively through experience; reason is merely a faculty for comparing ideas gained through experience; it is thus parasitic upon experience, and has no claim whatsoever to grasp anything about the world itself, let alone any special claim. For Kant, reason is a mental faculty with an inherent tendency to transgress the bounds of possible experience in an effort to grasp the metaphysical foundations of the phenomenal realm. Since knowledge of the world is limited to objects of possible experience, for Kant, reason, with its delusions of grasping reality beyond those limits, must be subject to critique.

Sometimes rationalism is charged with neglecting or undervaluing experience, and with embarrassingly having no means of accounting for the tremendous success of the experimental sciences. While the criticism of the confidence placed in reason may be defensible given a certain conception of reason (which may or may not itself be ultimately defensible), the latter charge of neglecting experience is not; more often than not it is the product of a false caricature of rationalism

Descartes and Leibniz were the leading mathematicians of their day, and stood at the forefront of science. While Spinoza distinguished himself more as a political thinker, and as an interpreter of scripture (albeit a notorious one) than as a mathematician, Spinoza too performed experiments, kept abreast of the leading science of the day, and was renowned as an expert craftsman of lenses. Far from neglecting experience, the great rationalists had, in general, a sophisticated understanding of the role of experience and, indeed, of experiment, in the acquisition and development of knowledge. The fact that the rationalists held that experience and experiment cannot serve as foundations for knowledge, but must be fitted within, and interpreted in light of, a rational epistemic framework, should not be confused with a neglect of experience and experiment.

a. Descartes

One of the stated purposes of Descartes’ Meditations, and, in particular, the hyperbolic doubts with which it commences, is to reveal to the mind of the reader the limitations of its reliance on the senses, which Descartes regards as an inadequate foundation for knowledge. By leading the mind away from the senses, which often deceive, and which yield only confused ideas, Descartes prepares the reader to discover the clear and distinct perceptions of the pure intellect, which provide a proper foundation for genuine knowledge. Nevertheless, empirical observations and experimentation clearly had an important role to play in Descartes’ natural philosophy, as evidenced by his own private empirical and experimental research, especially in optics and anatomy, and by his explicit statements in several writings on the role and importance of observation and experiment.

In Part 6 of the Discourse on the Method, Descartes makes an open plea for assistance – both financial and otherwise – in making systematic empirical observations and conducting experiments. Also in Discourse Part 6, Descartes lays out his program for developing knowledge of nature. It begins with the discovery of “certain seeds of truth” implanted naturally in our souls (CSM I, 144). From them, Descartes seeks to derive the first principles and causes of everything. Descartes’ Meditations illustrates these first stages of the program. By “seeds of truth” Descartes has in mind certain intuitions, including the ideas of thinking, and extension, and, in particular, of God. On the basis of clearly and distinctly perceiving the distinction between what belongs properly to extension (figure, position, motion) and what does not (colors, sounds, smells, and so forth), Descartes discovers the principles of physics, including the laws of motion. From these principles, it is possible to deduce many particular ways in which the details of the world might be, only a small fraction of which represent the way the world actually is. It is as a result of the distance, as it were, between physical principles and laws of nature, on one hand, and the particular details of the world, on the other, that, for Descartes, observations and experiments become necessary.

Descartes is ambivalent about the relationship between physical principles and particulars, and about the role that observation and experiment play in mediating this relationship. On the one hand, Descartes expresses commitment to the ideal of a science deduced with certainty from intuitively grasped first principles. Because of the great variety of mutually incompatible consequences that can be derived from physical principles, observation and experiment are required even in the ideal deductive science to discriminate between actual consequences and merely possible ones. According to the ideal of deductive science, however, observation and experiment should be used only to facilitate the deduction of effects from first causes, and not as a basis for an inference to possible explanations of natural phenomena, as Descartes makes clear at one point his Principles of Philosophy (CSM I, 249). If the explanations were only possible, or hypothetical, the science could not lay claim to certainty per the deductive ideal, but merely to probability.

On the other hand, Descartes states explicitly at another point in the Principles of Philosophy that the explanations provided of such phenomena as the motion of celestial bodies and the nature of the earth’s elements should be regarded merely as hypotheses arrived at on the basis of a posteriori reasoning (CSM I, 255); while Descartes says that such hypotheses must agree with observation and facilitate predictions, they need not in fact reflect the actual causes of phenomena. Descartes appears to concede, albeit reluctantly, that when it comes to explaining particular phenomena, hypothetical explanations and moral certainty (that is, mere probability) are all that can be hoped for.

Scholars have offered a range of explanations for the inconsistency in Descartes’ writings on the question of the relation between first principles and particulars. It has been suggested that the inconsistency within the Principles of Philosophy reflects different stages of its composition (see Garber 1978). However the inconsistency might be explained, it is clear that Descartes did not take it for granted that the ideal of a deductive science of nature could be realized. Moreover, whether or not Descartes ultimately believed the ideal of deductive science was realizable, he was unambiguous on the importance of observation and experiment in bridging the distance between physical principles and particular phenomena. (For further discussion, see René Descartes: Scientific Method.)

b. Spinoza

The one work that Spinoza published under his own name in his lifetime was his geometrical reworking of Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy. In Spinoza’s presentation of the opening sections of Part 3 of Descartes’ Principles, Spinoza puts a strong emphasis on the hypothetical nature of the explanations of natural phenomena in Part 3. Given the hesitance and ambivalence with which Descartes concedes the hypothetical nature of his explanations in his Principles, Spinoza’s unequivocal insistence on hypotheses is striking. Elsewhere Spinoza endorses hypotheses more directly. In the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza describes forming the concept of a sphere by affirming the rotation of a semicircle in thought. He points out that this idea is a true idea of a sphere even if no sphere has ever been produced this way in nature (The Collected Works of Spinoza, Vol. 1, p. 32). Spinoza’s view of hypotheses relates to his conception of good definitions (see Section 3, b, above). If the cause through which one conceives something allows for the deduction of all possible effects, then the cause is an adequate one, and there is no need to fear a false hypothesis. Spinoza appears to differ from Descartes in thinking that the formation of hypotheses, if done properly, is consistent with deductive certainty, and not tantamount to mere probability or moral certainty.

Again in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza speaks in Baconian fashion of identifying “aids” that can assist in the use of the senses and in conducting orderly experiments. Unfortunately, Spinoza’s comments regarding “aids” are very unclear. This is perhaps explained by the fact that they appear in a work that Spinoza never finished. Nevertheless, it does seem clear that although Spinoza, like Descartes, emphasized the importance of discovering proper principles from which to deduce knowledge of everything else, he was no less aware than Descartes of the need to proceed via observation and experiment in descending from such principles to particulars. At the same time, given his analysis of the inadequacy of sensory images, the collection of empirical data must be governed by rules and rational guidelines the details of which it does not seem that Spinoza ever worked out.

A valuable perspective on Spinoza’s attitude toward experimentation is provided by Letter 6, which Spinoza wrote to Oldenburg with comments on Robert Boyle’s experimental research. Among other matters, at issue is Boyle’s “redintegration” (or reconstitution) of niter (potassium nitrate). By heating niter with a burning coal, Boyle separated the niter into a “fixed” part and a volatile part; he then proceeded to distill the volatile part, and recombine it with the fixed part, thereby redintegrating the niter. Boyle’s aim was to show that the nature of niter is not determined by a Scholastic “substantial form,” but rather by the composition of parts, whose secondary qualities (color, taste, smell, and so forth) are determined by primary qualities (size, position, motion, and so forth). While taking no issue with Boyle’s attempt to undermine the Scholastic analysis of physical natures, Spinoza criticized Boyle’s interpretation of the experiment, arguing that the fixed niter was merely an impurity left over, and that there was no difference between the niter and the volatile part other than a difference of state.

Two things stand out from Spinoza’s comments on Boyle. On the one hand, Spinoza exhibits a degree of impatience with Boyle’s experiments, charging some of them with superfluity on the grounds either that what they show is evident on the basis of reason alone, or that previous philosophers have already sufficiently demonstrated them experimentally. In addition, Spinoza’s own interpretation of Boyle’s experiment is primarily based in a rather speculative, Cartesian account of the mechanical constitution of niter (as Boyle himself points out in response to Spinoza). On the other hand, Spinoza appears eager to show his own fluency with experimental practice, describing no fewer than three different experiments of his own invention to support his interpretation of the redintegration. What Spinoza is critical of is not so much Boyle’s use of experiment per se as his relative neglect of relevant rational considerations. For instance, Spinoza at one point criticizes Boyle for trying to show that secondary qualities depend on primary qualities on experimental grounds. Spinoza thought the proposition needed to be demonstrated on rational grounds.  While Spinoza acknowledges the importance and necessity of observation and experiment, his emphasis and focus is on the rational framework needed for making sense of experimental findings, without which the results are confused and misleading.

c. Leibniz

In principle, Leibniz thinks it is not impossible to discover the interior constitution of bodies a priori on the basis of a knowledge of God and the “principle of the best” according to which He creates the world. Leibniz sometimes remarks that angels could explain to us the intelligible causes through which all things come about, but he seems conflicted over whether such understanding is actually possible for human beings. Leibniz seems to think that while the a priori pathway should be pursued in this life by the brightest minds in any case, its perfection will only be possible in the afterlife. The obstacle to an a priori conception of things is the complexity of sensible effects. In this life, then, knowledge of nature cannot be purely a priori, but depends on observation and experimentation in conjunction with reason

Apart from perception, we have clear and distinct ideas only of magnitude, figure, motion, and other such quantifiable attributes (primary qualities). The goal of all empirical research must be to resolve phenomena (including secondary qualities) into such distinctly perceived, quantifiable notions. For example, heat is explained in terms of some particular motion of air or some other fluid. Only in this way can the epistemic ideal be achieved of understanding how phenomena follow from their causes in the same way that we know how the hammer stroke after a period of time follows from the workings of a clock (L, 173). To this end, experiments must be carried out to indicate possible relationships between secondary qualities and primary qualities, and to provide a basis for the formulation of hypotheses to explain the phenomena.

Nevertheless, there is an inherent limitation to this procedure. Leibniz explains that if there were people who had no direct experience of heat, for instance, even if someone were to explain to them the precise mechanical cause of heat, they would still not be able to know the sensation of heat, because they would still not distinctly grasp the connection between bodily motion and perception (L, 285). Leibniz seems to think that human beings will never be able to bridge the explanatory gap between sensations and mechanical causes. There will always be an irreducibly confused aspect of sensible ideas, even if they can be associated with a high degree of sophistication with distinctly perceivable, quantifiable notions. However, this limitation does not mean, for Leibniz, that there is any futility in human efforts to understand the world scientifically. In the first place, experimental knowledge of the composition of things is tremendously useful in practice, even if the composition is not distinctly perceived in all its parts. As Leibniz points out, the architect who uses stones to erect a cathedral need not possess a distinct knowledge of the bits of earth interposed between the stones (L, 175). Secondly, even if our understanding of the causes of sensible effects must remain forever hypothetical, the hypotheses themselves can be more or less refined, and it is proper experimentation that assists in their refinement.

6. References and Further Reading

When citing the works of Descartes, the three volume English translation by Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, and Kenny was used. For the original language, the edition by Adam and Tannery was consulted.

When citing Spinoza’s Ethics, the translation by Curley in A Spinoza Reader was used. The following system of abbreviation was used when citing passages from the Ethics: the first number designates the part of the Ethics (1-5); then, “p” is for proposition, “d” for definition, “a” for axiom, “dem” for demonstration, “c” for corollary, and “s” for scholium. So, 1p17s refers to the scholium of the seventeenth proposition of the first part of the Ethics. For the original language, the edition by Gebhardt was consulted.

For the original language in Leibniz, the edition by Gerhardt was consulted.

a. Primary Sources

  • Bacon, Francis. The Works of Francis Bacon. 7 Volumes. Edited by J. Spedding, R. L. Ellis, and D.D. Heath. London: Longmans, 1857-70. Cited above as Spedding, volume, page.
  • Bacon, Francis. The New Organon. Edited by Lisa Jardine and Michael Silverthorne. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Descartes, René. Oeuvres de Descartes. 12 Volumes. Edited by C. Adam and P. Tannery. Paris: J. Vrin, 1964-76.
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Author Information

Matthew Homan
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.

African Sage Philosophy

The Sage Philosophy Project began in the mid-1970s at the Department of Philosophy of the University of Nairobi Kenya. At the University, Henry Odera Oruka (1944-1995) popularized the term “Sage Philosophy Project,” and closely related terms such as “philosophic sagacity,” both by initiating a project of interviewing African sages, and by naming this project in a widely read popular article as the most promising of four trends of the relatively new field of African philosophy.

This encyclopedia article focuses primarily on Oruka and his immediate sources of inspiration, and then includes others whose projects share similar methodologies and goals.

Although the definition of the key terms is not always completely uniform, at the heart of this approach to African philosophy lies the emphasis on academically-trained philosophy students and professors interviewing non-academic wise persons whom Oruka called “sages,” and then engaging philosophically with the interview material. Oruka usually (but not always) emphasized keeping the identity of the individual sage well known.  He also insisted that it was the sage who knew the traditions of his or her ethnic group the best, and who would be able to have critical distance to evaluate and sometimes reject prevailing beliefs and practices. The goals of collecting the interviews and evaluating them have been articulated in Oruka’s many works. The first goal was to help construct texts of indigenous African philosophies. Before Oruka's project there was a dearth of existing texts and a need to record indigenous ideas, both for posterity (that is, for a sense of identity and for historical reasons) and for the present and future. African wisdom that had been marginalized by academia, and by city life, could provide valuable solutions to contemporaneous problems in Africa. Such texts of interviews could also sustain intellectual curiosity and provide practical guidance (or phronesis).

Oruka searched for sages and wanted a wider public to know not only their words (written down in transcripts) but also about their lives.  For him, a sage’s worth was not only in their ideas but also in the way they live: by embodying their philosophies, developing their character, and affecting their communities over the years. After all, the sages in Kenya operate in contexts of social conflict and exploitation. Sages are those from whom others seek moral and metaphysical advice and consultation on issues involving moral and psychological attitudes and judgments.Oruka looked to the term japaro in Luo, meaning “thinker,” to approximate the translation of sage. The term japaro is closely related to jang’ ad rieko which means “professional advisor.” He emphasized that people would single out sages for advice on even the most delicate matters.

Table of Contents

  1. Oruka Biography and Early Writings
  2. Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context
  3. Beginning Interviews in Kenya
  4. Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study
  5. Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages
  6. Criticisms of Sage Philosophy
  7. Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages
  8. Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years
  9. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students
  10. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Oruka Biography and Early Writings

The history of the project begins in the 1970s; nevertheless, it is important to understand the project's beginning in the context of its immediate precursors, both those that served as partial models and those that served as negative examples of what must not be done. It is also important to know something about Oruka’s academic training and background, and the skills and interests he brought to the project.

Oruka grew up surrounded by sages in his home area of Ugenya, in the Nyanza Province of Kenya, and as a youth he looked up to them and learned much wisdom from them. Graduating from St. Mary’s High School in Yala, he won a scholarship to study geography at Uppsala University in Sweden. While there, Oruka was influenced by philosophy Professor Ingemar Hedenius to follow his newly developing interests and study philosophy instead. Philosophy studies at Uppsala were divided into two tracks, Practical and Theoretical, and Oruka specialized in Practical Philosophy: Applied Ethics and Political Philosophy. The approach to philosophy Oruka learned both in Sweden and later at Wayne State University in Detroit, Michigan, was greatly influenced by the logical empiricists.  Indeed, Oruka referred to himself an empiricist as well (Practical 283). He would later remark that this narrow emphasis on analytic philosophy that he received in his formal training was an initial “handicap” to his ability to enter the debates on African philosophy upon his return to Kenya (Oruka, Trends 127).

When he returned to Kenya in 1970, Oruka became one of the first two African philosophy faculty members at University of Nairobi. At that time, many departments at the University of Nairobi (UON) were questioning the Eurocentric curriculum that was their colonial heritage. Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Okot p’Bitek, and Taban Lo Liyong were some of the scholars challenging the curriculum in literature, development studies, and other areas (Ogot). The Institute for African Studies at UON was founded in 1970.  Sage philosophy was an attempt to rise to the challenge of imagining an approach to philosophy that focused on African ideas and realities. The fields of literature and history had turned to oral sources; there was no reason that philosophy could not do the same.

When Oruka received his first full-time position in 1970, the field of African Philosophy was dominated by Placide Tempels, John Mbiti, and other early scholars who sometimes blurred the line between religious and philosophical thinking. Also, at that time, the Philosophy and Religious Studies departments at UON were merged. Having studied with Hedenius, famous for his arguments in favor of atheism, Oruka distinguished himself with early essays in 1972 and 1975 denouncing much of what was passing for “African philosophy” as no more than dressed-up mythical thinking. (He later judged these articles as “youthful” as well as “simplistic and unnecessarily offensive” Oruka, Trends 12, n.1; 125-29; Practical 285; Graness and Kresse 12). He championed a secular and logical approach to life’s big questions. However, also impressed by the need to appreciate an unfairly-marginalized, substantial body of thought coming from Africa, Oruka proposed his “sage philosophy” project as a way to provide missing information about African ideas and values. He was convinced that rural sages were not merely “religious figures” but thinkers who used their own rational powers to develop insights, and who could explain their reasoning to others.

In his early 1972 article "Mythologies as African Philosophy" Oruka was to insist on jettisoning traditions harmful to Africa’s present and future. He criticized both Placide Tempels' book Bantu Philosophy and John Mbiti's book African Religions and Philosophy as backward-looking champions of absolutely unphilosophical African traditions. He agreed with Fanon’s criticism of a certain type of misguided African intellectual who falsely builds up the greatness of African tradition in a futile attempt to convince Europeans that African culture is as good as theirs. Oruka wanted instead to write for an African audience (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 23).

In "Mythologies," Oruka began to articulate his emphasis on the need to acknowledge individual thinkers. By anonymizing everyone and providing only group consensus, Tempels, Mbiti, and W. E. Abraham (author of The Mind of Africa) presented “philosophy without philosophers.” He suggested, “We can as well start afresh by interviewing sage Africans and eliciting philosophical expositions from them” (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 30). While individuals’ thinking is influenced by their community and material conditions, they are not determined by them, and in fact individuals can also influence groups. Oruka also pointed out that a philosopher’s role is not just to describe how people think and act, but to make suggestions as to how they ought to think and act (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 31).

2. Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context

Oruka conceived of the project in relation to interjections from Kwasi Wiredu and Paulin Hountondji, whom he had met and who had both been invited to University of Nairobi. He had become familiar with their written works in early philosophy journals published in Africa, such as Second Order (University of Ife Press, Nigeria), Universitas (Accra), and Cahiers philosophiques africains/African philosophical journal (Zaire) (Oruka, Trends 129-30, 132-33). Both scholars had studied philosophy in African universities and abroad, Wiredu at University College, Oxford, and Hountondji at the École Normale Supérieure, and both were critical of the ethnophilosophical approaches of Tempels and Mbiti.

Wiredu, based in Ghana, emphasized the secular and rational nature of much ethical thought among the Akan groups in Ghana. He outlined three major hindrances to African cultural regeneration: anachronism, authoritarianism, and supernaturalism. But he also insisted that Africa had very wise and philosophical persons from whom a lot could be learned, especially if one paid attention to the nuances of concepts in African languages. In a 1972 issue of Second Order, Wiredu wrote that “it is a particular (though not exclusive) responsibility of African philosophers to research into their traditional background of philosophical thought” ("On an African Orientation" 12). However, he argued, while traditional concepts and codes of conduct should be an area of study, they should not lead to anachronism—an attempt to turn back the hands of time or cling to the days of yesteryear (7).

Wiredu was the first to label “what ‘our elders’ said” as “folk philosophies.” He found exciting the prospect of constructing, from “the living wise men of the tribe,” “the elaborate and argumentative reasons” behind the belief systems and moral guidelines of “our philosophers of old.”  Still, the resulting material could not, Wiredu believed, help to tackle most modern problems in Africa ("On an African Orientation" 5). Along with interest in past traditions, he maintained, scientific method and clear argumentation were necessary to guide African youths in confronting the new moral dilemmas facing contemporary African society. Barry Hallen, scrutinizing Wiredu’s article, says that Wiredu intended the phrase “folk philosophies” to refer to unreasoned beliefs whether they were African or Western (Hallen "Yoruba" 106-08). Wiredu followed up this exploration with an article that Oruka recommended to his readers, in which Wiredu compared and contrasted the meaning of “philosopher” and “wise man.” The material, first published in the article (Wiredu "What Is"), was later incorporated in Wiredu’s book (Wiredu Philosophy 139-173; see Oruka Trends 69n5).

Three years later (1975), in Second Order, Oruka explained that he and others at UON were already engaged in a project along the lines of Wiredu’s description. He said, “We are seeking to unsheathe, through constant contacts and discussions with those concerned, the elaborate philosophical views and reasons from the living traditional Kenyan thinkers and sages” (Oruka "The Fundamental" 54n6). He followed Wiredu’s words and ideas closely enough to repeat the descriptors “elaborate” and “reasons.” In his subsequent book he adopted the descriptors “folk philosophies” and “folk sage,” but clarified that, in addition to elders who are examples of folk sagacity, there were some philosophic sages able to scrutinize prevailing beliefs and give sustained arguments for their positions. The elders, he asserted, were more than just depositories of outdated folk wisdom. Philosophical sages were able both to describe the “culture philosophy” held by most members of their community and also to evaluate the content (or at least understand the genesis) of such culture philosophies.  In Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) Wiredu affirmed that “The recording and critical study of the thought of individual indigenous thinkers is worthy of the most serious attention of contemporary African philosophers” (37). In Cultural Universals and Particulars (1996), Wiredu wrote that Oruka’s sage philosophy book was the first to give “substantial notice” to individual philosophical thinkers in Africa (116).

Paulin Hountondji was another key influence on the development of sage philosophy. Hountondji gave a talk, "Philosophy and Its Revolutions," at the National University of Zaire during “Special Philosophy Days" in June 1973, and a second time at University of Nairobi in November, 1973.  Invitations for these talks came from the Philosophical Association of Kenya, which Oruka had founded (African 71).A paper based on the talks was published in French in 1973 in Cahiers philosophiques africains/African Philosophical Journal and later incorporated into Hountondji's book, African Philosophy: Myth and Reality (71-108). Hountondji’s “Revolution” article, and chapter, which Oruka and other Kenyans heard in person in 1973, criticized Tempels’ book Bantu Philosophy but appreciated the works of two European anthropologists, Paul Radin and Marcel Griaule, suggesting that their approach was much more careful than Tempels'. In fact, Hountondji said, Tempels’ study was “behind the anthropology of the time” (African 76). Twenty years earlier than Tempels, Radin wrote Primitive Man as Philosopher, a study of philosophy in Africa that focused on original thinkers who were members of an intellectual class in their communities. Hountoundji explained that Radin denounced the prejudice that African individuals are submerged in unitary group-think and took it upon himself to transcribe faithfully what members of this intellectual class told him (African 76; “La Philosophie” 30-31).

Paul Radin was an anthropologist originally from Poland who had studied with Franz Boas at Columbia University. Radin recorded interviews with members of a Native American community from Nebraska called the Winnebago. He explained in his book the necessity of researchers presenting “statements made by the Winnebago” word-for-word to the public, rather than merely recounting others’ ideas in ways that mixed the researcher’s interpretation with the words and views of those interviewed (64). Researchers who thought they did readers a service, by weaving together narratives and accounts of multiple informants in a harmonizing way, actually hid the extent of disagreement and diversity of opinion in the community (xxxviii).. Since primary sources are so valuable, Radin advocated a method of careful direct questioning, a process which under the best circumstances “can become something analogous to a true philosophical dialogue” (xxxi). Radin first published his book in 1927 but came out with a second edition in 1957 which critiqued Placide Tempels’ approach as presumptive and wrong-headed insofar as Tempels presumed to describe Bantu philosophy on behalf of Bantu speaking people, instead of letting them speak for themselves.

Hountondji stated that “Radin’s work is still, to the best of my knowledge, the most lucid ethnological critique of the theoretical assumptions of ethnophilosophy” (African 79). He praised Radin for showing the level of variations in retellings of particular myths and the ways each narrator influenced the myth in their own way, thus demonstrating the “profound individualism” among African intellectuals. Though he faulted Radin for use of the insulting word “primitive,” Hountondji was struck by how, unlike other Western anthropologists, Radin conveyed Africa as a place with views as plural as those of Western societies (African 79). While Radin’s study predated Oruka’s coining of the term “sage philosophy,” certainly Radin’s project shared much in common (both in goals and method) with Oruka’s later project. While Radin’s own first-hand research was with the Winnebago tribe (now more accurately called the Ho-Chunk people) in North America, Radin’s book drew upon primary source narratives of philosophical thought from various communities around the world, including proverbs and poems from Africa.

John Dewey, who wrote the foreword to Radin’s book, thanked Radin for challenging certain common misconceptions of Africa, which tended to present Africans as accepting “automatic moral standards” based on custom, when in fact African communities respected freedom of expression and emphasized individual moral responsibility (Radin xix). The relationship and consistency between Radin’s approach and that of Oruka’s sage philosophy project was alluded to by Kai Kresse (27-28), Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage 244n27), and Godwin Azenabor (73).

While Oruka probably heard about Radin in Hountondji’s 1973 presentation in Nairobi, Oruka nowhere credited Radin as an inspiration for his own chosen methods. In fact, Oruka engaged in a lifelong castigation of anthropologists, condemning them along with missionaries like Tempels. Oruka presumed that all anthropologists anonymized and conglomerated their sources into one, and he asserted that no anthropologist had devised a method similar to his own. Another important distinction to highlight is that Radin made extensive use of proverbs, poems, and songs, which he considered primary sources even if the specific authors were unknown, and found profound philosophical thought in these sources. Many in the field of African philosophy have also argued for using these kinds of sources as philosophical sources, for example, Kwame Gyekye of Ghana (An Essay 8-19) and Claude Sumner, a Canadian who researched Ethiopian philosophy for many years, and Ethiopian philosopher Workineh Kelbessa (“Logic"; Indigenous chap. 11). Even Oruka’s philosophy colleague at UON, Gerald Wanjohi, engaged in extensive analysis of proverbs (Wanjohi Wisdom). Oruka did not consider the study of proverbs to be related to his project. He narrowly focused on interviews with living sages as his only source, despite the fact that other contemporaries of his argued that one could find clear expression of logical argument as well as insightful reflection in proverbs (Sumner 22-23, 391-403). In an article he wrote on Sumner, Oruka mentioned that Sumner spent much effort studying and publishing Oromo proverbs (Practical 156), and maintained that studying proverbs is a different method than ethnophilosophy, but he did not develop these ideas. In Sage Philosophy (1990 ed. 115-16; 1991 ed. 117), the sage Simiyu Chaungo discussed the use of proverbs, but it is the only time proverbs are mentioned in the book.

Along with Radin, Hountonji’s 1973 article also included Marcel Griaule as an example of anthropologists whose methods differed from Tempels' (31). Griaule interviewed Ogotemmeli, a Dogon elder in Mali, at length. Hountondji was disappointed that certain political factions inside and outside of Africa preferred Tempels’ style of massive, definitive synthesis of all Bantu views to capturing the plurality and disorderliness of individual thought by direct interview. In the preface to the second edition of his book, which included “Philosophy and Its Revolutions," Hountondji again reiterated his 1974 opinion of Griaule as an important trend-setter:

The French anthropologist had chosen to transcribe the words of one sage among many. He showed the possibility of a long term project which would consist of a systematic transcription of such speeches, at least as a starting point of a critical discussion—what my Kenyan colleague the late Odera Oruka would later call “philosophical sagacity”—rather than as reconstruction of implicit philosophy behind the habits and customs of the host society through a lot of non-verifiable hypotheses which always amount to over-interpreting the facts”(ix).

In 1996, Hountondji saw Griaule’s project as an earlier version of Oruka’s project. He reiterated his estimation of Griaule in his reflections, published in English as The Struggle for Meaning (2002). In this work he reflected on his views back in 1970, saying of Griaule’s work:  “Voluntarily assigning to himself the humble task of a secretary, custodian, transcriber of the worldview of a black sage, of one spiritual master among others, the French ethnologist gave the example of scientific patience and, in my eyes, did more useful work than the ethnophilosophers proper who were in a hurry to reach definitive conclusions on African philosophy in general” (99).

Oruka himself was not that impressed with Griaule and Ogotommeli. In his 1983 article in International Philosophical Quarterly, later included in Sage Philosophy, Oruka argued that Ogotemmeli was at best a “folk sage” and not a philosophical sage, because he did not transcend his group’s views. Therefore, Griaule was not engaged in sage philosophy, but only in “culture philosophy” (Oruka Sage, 1991 ed., 34, 47, 49-50).

Hountondji and Oruka both missed research published by other anthropologists in the 1960s that cast doubt on whether Griaule really followed his professed method of interviewing one person and transcribing what that person said. D. A. Masolo made a thorough review of the anthropological literature on Griaule, most but not all of it in French, in which the authors questioned whether the conversation was recorded verbatim on the series of days that Griaule recounted. They suspected Griaule of reconstructing the conversation (Masolo African 69, 77, 260). Jack Goody’s book review discussed the painstaking detail an interview must have in order to meet standards of even a “soft” science like anthropology. The words of the person interviewed should be clearly demarcated from those that are the author's commentary. Field notes should be identified as such and distinguished from the words of the on-site translator. Original language transcriptions should be available, and the difficulty of translating esoteric words should be discussed by the author. Griaule’s book did not meet these standards (Goody review). Kibujjo Kalumba, who considered Griaule’s book on Ogotommeli one of three possible sources of sage philosophy, complained that the book contained too much of Griaule’s re-wording of Ogotommeli’s ideas (274, 276).

While Oruka declared in 1972 his intent to interview wise elders, he had just the previous year been quite critical of another philosopher’s use of the interview method applied to the topic of Ethics. Tore Nordenstam, a Norwegian based in Khartoum, Sudan, had interviewed three of his students, and on the basis of the interviews, published a book called Sudanese Ethics. In his rather harshly critical review of the book, Oruka questioned how interviews could be helpful at all in the study of ethics.

Oruka himself changed from someone with antipathy toward Nordenstam’s project to a person who promoted a large project interviewing African sages. His own project tried to avoid all of the pitfalls he pointed out in Nordenstam’s project: he did not interview students; he tried to interview those without exposure to studies in European philosophy; he addressed gender issues in most of his interviews; and he asked his interviewees sensitive political questions, even at great risk to himself (as in his interviews with Oginga Odinga). He shared with Nordenstam the focus on ethical issues. Before leaving this section on early precursors and influences on sage philosophy, it is important to note that a Kenyan scholar wrote an article in 1959 that is considered by several African philosophy scholars to be a clear precedent to sage philosophy. Taaita Towett (d. 2007) is known these days mostly for his role in Kenyan education and politics. As Minister of Education, he was “Patron” of the Philosophical Association of Kenya (see Thought and Practice 1.2 [1974] inside back cover). Towett's 1959 article, translated into French as “Le Role d’un philosophie Africain,” “earlier expressed an identical argument” to Oruka’s, according to Ochieng’-Odhaimbo ("The Tripartite" 30n4). In the PhD thesis he wrote under Oruka’s supervision (later excerpted in Sage Philosophy) and in a 1983 journal article, Anthony Oseghare claimed that Towett’s 1959 article provided “evidence of the existence of critical philosophical reasoning in Africa” (Oseghare "Sagacity" 95; Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 237). D. A. Masolo noted that Towett, as Oruka did later, argued that literacy was not a prerequisite for philosophizing and that Socrates was an example of an oral philosopher. Towett and Oruka both contended that “there must have been African philosophers engaged in the formulation of culture philosophy” (Masolo African Philosophy 236).

3. Beginning Interviews in Kenya

In his published works, Oruka explained that he began his sage philosophy project along with his philosophy colleague Joseph Donders, a White Father from the Netherlands ("The Fundamental" 54n6; Sage 1991 ed., 17-18). Donders explained that the funds for the study were originally received from the UON’s Dean’s Committee ("Don't Fence" 11).

Oruka’s early publications describing his projects and his methods began in the mid-1970s.  At the time, Oruka made it clear that his project was a national one, and was to include wise sages from a wide variety of ethnic groups in Kenya. At this time, there was a lot of focus on building up Kenya’s national identity, and Oruka wanted his project to be a unifier for the country, where all Kenyans could take pride in a common heritage of wise philosophers. He also wanted Kenyans to evaluate and be able to justify their cultural practices (see Oruka "Philosophy"; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 116-117; Presbey “Attempts”). At the same time, Oruka focused on sages who could articulate reasons for their philosophical and ethical positions that did not rely on mere tradition or on religious authority. He also focused on the individual identities and arguments of the sages rather than melding the ideas of individuals into the “group think” of an ethnic group; to do the latter would have been to engage in the common error in African studies in philosophy.

As F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo has noted, the exact terminology for Oruka’s project has changed over time. In 1974, when Oruka first announced his project, he called it “Thoughts on Traditional Kenyan Sages.” He first coined the term “philosophic sagacity” in 1978, referring to individual critical and reflective sages engaging in thought in such a way that even European or analytic philosophers would have to admit that philosophers were present in Africa. He created and emphasized the approach as an alternative to ethnophilosophy, which he disparaged. Ochieng’-Odhiambo noted that as early as 1983, Oruka called those engaged in philosophic sagacity “sage philosophers.” He contrasted them to ordinary sages (later called “folk sages”) who, in 1983, were not considered philosophical because they lacked critical reflection and ability to create independent positions on topics. In 1984, in “Philosophy in English Speaking Africa,” Oruka used the term “sage philosophy.” At first, the two terms “philosophic sagacity” and “sage philosophy” were used interchangeably and no distinctions were drawn. But during this third stage of Oruka’s works (1984–1995), he used the term “philosophic sagacity” increasingly less, while he used “sage philosophy” increasingly more. Oruka then used the term “sage philosophy” retrospectively to refer to his pre-1984 works (Ochieng’-Odhaimbo, "The Evolution" 19, 24).

The term “philosophic sagacity” Ochieng’-Odhiambo says, was first presented in Oruka’s “Four Trends in African Philosophy” at a conference on Dr. William Amo in Accra, Ghana, in July,  1978 (Oruka Trends 21n1; also see Ochieng’-Odhaimbo "Philosophic Sagacity: Aims"). "Four Trends" was later revised and presented at the World Congress of Philosophy conference in Dusseldorf, Germany, in August, 1978 (Ochieng’-Odhiambo "The Evolution" 22, 30n6). However a Nigerian philosopher, M. Akin Makinde, commenting on Oruka’s popularization of the term, claimed to be the originator of the term in the context of African philosophy. Makinde said he used the term “philosophic sagacity” (with a different connotation than Oruka) earlier than Oruka in a conference paper he presented in June, 1978, at University of Ife (Makinde “Robin"; “Philosophy" 107). Makinde’s 1978 paper drew upon concepts in Bombastus Paracelsus’ essay Philosophia Sagax. Collins English Dictionary explains that “philosophic” is a term created in Middle English around 1350-1400 C.E. that meant “learned, pertaining to alchemy.” Makinde claimed that Oruka used the term and concept “wrongly” but admitted that Oruka’s usage became the more widespread (African 9, 122, 137). Many scholars in African philosophy do not pay attention to the term “philosophic” and refer to Oruka’s method as “philosophical sagacity” (for example see Hallen African 68-75; Imbo 25-26).

Oruka articulated his project and his methods in the context of growing debates on the topic of African philosophy. He spearheaded the founding of the Philosophical Association of Kenya and the creation of its journal, Thought and Practice, in 1974. In his famous “Four Trends” article, he divided African Philosophy into four diverse interests/trends with differing methodologies (ethno-, nationalist-ideological, and professional philosophies including his own, philosophic sagacity).  At these venues and in publications he explained how his own project was not just another example of the wrong-headed “ethnophilosophy” approach (criticized by Paulin Hountondji) but was instead an alternative to it.

In a 1988 article of Oruka’s first published in German and later included in English in Trends (50-69), Oruka described his sage philosophy project, listed eight sages (all men) who were part of his study, and gave a biography of each. Two of them, Paul Mbuya Akoko (d. 1981) and Oruka Rang'inya (d. 1979), would be included at greater length in his soon-to-be-released, book-length study of sage philosophy. The others mentioned in 1988 had only biographies and short excerpts of their interviews in the German-language article, which were repeated in two books.  These latter sages were Njeru wa Kanuenje, Nyaga wa Mauch, Arap Baliach, Muganda Okwako (d. 1979), Joash Walumoli, and Kasina Wa Ndoo (Trends 57-61, 66-67; Sage 1991 ed., 37-40).  Oruka explained that he and researcher Jesse N.K. Mugambi interviewed Njeru wa Kanyenje of Embu district together, in the Embu language (Trends 66, 132).

Oruka’s book Sage Philosophy was published first by Brill in 1990 and later in Nairobi in 1991. There are a few differences between the two publications, but most changes are minor editorial ones, with the major exception that chapter one of the Brill edition has an extra twelve pages telling the background of the study. The book has three parts. The first is Oruka’s introduction to his project. Here, Oruka gathered (with little revision) several of his articles on sage philosophy that had been published over the years. The second part includes interviews with sages, and the third part includes commentators and critics. Documentation of the sages as individuals, and the publication of their originally oral philosophical thoughts, are crucial to Oruka’s methodology; this stands in contrast to ethnophilosophy’s practice of summarizing what informants (often anonymous) say and searching for a common denominator. Also in the second part, a brief biographical sketch and photograph precedes each interview. Oruka insisted on identifying both folk and philosophic sages in the same manner. In this way, his project does not merely repeat the same ground covered by ethnophilosophy.

The book minimizes the editorial/interpretive role of the professional philosopher, in comparison to other anthropological approaches, by including direct excerpts from interviews of sages who were self-conscious of their role as cultural critics and were respected for the critical views they articulated. Interviews with sages covered topics related to philosophy of religion (such as the existence of God, life after death, and so forth), free will and determinism, and ethics. These topics were of central concern to Oruka, whose own academic background from Uppsala was in practical philosophy rather than theoretical philosophy. Oruka mentioned “Chaungo Barasa, Fred Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Sam Oluoch Imbo, Samuel Wanjohi Kimiti and Mwangi Samuel Chege” as his key research assistants in the project (Sage 1991 ed., xi).

Oruka closely followed this first book-length publication with a monograph focusing on the interviews of Jaramogi Oginga Odinga. He explained that for the 1982 interviews he was accompanied by E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo, a well-known Kenyan historian who focuses on oral history, and in 1992 Chaungo Barasa assisted him. Odera Oruka provided his own commentary on the interviews, which focused on Odinga’s love of truth, and how Odinga’s commitment to truth and love of the masses contrasted with Plato’s own position in the Republic regarding the myth of metals, sometimes called the “noble lie” (Oginga Odinga xi, 3-4, 12-13).

4. Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study

Barry Hallen and J. Olubi Sodipo engaged in a research project that involved interviewing wise men among the Yoruba in Nigeria. They began their project around the same time as Oruka, in 1973-74.  As Hallen and Sodipo explain, they started in 1973 with a non-credit student study group at the University of Lagos. During university breaks they asked students to “establish face-to-face fieldwork relationships with the elders and wise men of their family compounds, villages, and towns” (Hallen and Sodipo 9). They chose the concept of the person as the theme for these first discussions. After this first study, they interviewed people in the Ekiti region from 1974-84 and moved the project to the University of Ife (now Obafemi Awolowo University) in 1975 (Hallen and Sodipo xvi, 11). Sodipo became head of the newly independent philosophy department that separated from the religious studies department in 1975.

Hallen and Sodipo chose to study herbalists and native doctors because they were more critically sophisticated than the “ordinary persons” whom they advised, and were able to offer theoretical concepts (10-11).  They explained that the onisegun (Yoruba wise men) they interviewed were organized into their own professional society called an egbe, with rules, evaluations, possible reprimands, and a pledge of secrecy. The onisegun were not mere masters of medicine, but rather, they “[gave] advice and counsel about business dealings, family problems, unhappy personal situations, religious problems, and the future, as well as about physical and mental illness” (13).  They did not name their individual interlocutors because, as they explained, those they interviewed requested to remain anonymous (14). They acknowledged that the practical questions regarding interviewing methods were many, and they tried to sort out the question: “is each man to be treated as an individual, potentially eccentric thinker, or are opinions to be somehow collated and presented as shared and communal?" (8). They followed the latter plan, due to the fact that they were studying language use. Their study had philosophical insights regarding how the use of words “knowledge” and “belief” were understood, and came to note that among the Yoruba, the use of the term translated as “knowledge” is much narrower than the usage in Britain or the United States, because it was reserved for first-hand knowledge alone. In Britain or the U.S., people commonly claimed to know a vast amount of information (in the form of propositions) that went beyond their first-hand knowledge (see Hallen and Sodipo; Hallen "Yoruba").

Because it involved academic philosophers interviewing wise elders in Africa, many people associated the Hallen and Sodipo project with Oruka’s sage philosophy project. However, at least in some of his writings, Oruka clarified that he did not consider their work that of sage philosophy due to its lack of emphasis on individual sages. In fact, Oruka complained that it looked like the onisegun of the study held views “in consensus” and therefore to study their views was “anthropology, not philosophy” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-10; quote, 10), or even “culture philosophy,” “cultural prejudices” or “philosophication” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 50). “Philosophication” is a term that Oruka intended to have a derogatory tone. At one point he defined it as “the discovery of a philosophy out of no philosophy;” he also played with coining the word “philosofolkation” which involved loving the “folk” so much that one invented a philosophy for them and made oneself its spokesperson (1990b, 7). Oruka’s criticisms began as early as his 1975 article, when he charged J. O. Sodipo with trying to pass off African superstitions regarding the agency of the Yoruba gods as an African understanding of cause and, hence, philosophical (Oruka "The Fundamental" 48). In a more conciliatory tone, he wrote in his 1983 article that the Hallen-Sodipo project, like Griaule’s Ogotemmeli, while not “philosophic sagacity,” may be “some form of sagacity” (Oruka "Sagacity" 389; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 133).

On this point, Ochieng’-Odhiambo pointed out ("The Evolution" 27) that a particular end note in an article of Oruka’s 1990 book, Trends in Contemporary African Philosophy (Oruka Trends 68), suggested that Hallen and Sodipo’s project might be part of sage philosophy, despite Oruka’s clarification in other works (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-9, 50) that it was not. This endnote is a bit indirect. Oruka listed Hallen and Sodipo’s works along with several others that directly address sage philosophy, and then added the caveat, “It is not the case that every one of these writings addresses itself to the direct question of Sage philosophy. But they all make special reference to a type of thinking in Africa that can only owe its existence to the thoughts of some wise men (and women) in traditional Africa.” This statement makes it sound like Hallen and Sodipo were fellow travelers. Interestingly enough, Oruka mentioned that at a certain point in his research he interviewed some sages who wanted their names withheld (Sage 1991 ed., 65n4), and he mentioned specifically a parallel with Hallen and Sodipo’s study.

In his 2006 book, African Philosophy: The Analytic Approach, Hallen agreed that it was best to keep his own project and Oruka’s separate. As good grounds for separating them, Hallen explained that his and Sodipo’s project was always intended to be an exercise in philosophy of language, and he admitted that such was not the case with Oruka’s interviews. He also acknowledged that Oruka wanted to keep them separate (4–5). But he also explained, in Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft, that he thought that the kinds of description of their project that Oruka engaged in were unkind and unfair. Oruka did not take into account that when one does philosophy of language one cannot help but search for common usages of terms and concepts. Hallen recounted in an afterword to the 1997 edition of Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft the shock he experienced upon first reading criticisms of their work such as this. He and Sodipo had been bracing for criticisms from anthropologists; they expected to be told that they weren’t properly trained to do fieldwork. But they were surprised to find themselves criticized by philosophers for advocating a communal consensus account of African thought, basically being accused of the dreaded “ethnophilosophy” as Hountondji had described it.

Hallen asked Hountodji and Oruka to rethink their criticism, since there was no way to practice ordinary language philosophical analysis, whether in Africa, England, or elsewhere, without focusing on common meanings. Hallen thought that the fact that their study was able to debunk many prevailing myths and stereotypes about Africa, including misconceptions made popular by some anthropologists that considered African thought as pre-reflective, uncritical, traditional, emotional, and non-reasonable. This was evidence that they should be appreciated, not lumped in with anthropologists and ethnophilosophers whose projects were evaluated negatively (Hallen and Sodipo 136-37n16; 140). Indeed, one of the surprising conclusions of Hallen and Sodipo’s study was that the onisegun had such stringent criteria for counting something as knowledge (that is, restricting it to first-hand experience, and requiring careful reporting and testimony from all witnesses), that they made Euro-Americans who accept second-hand propositional knowledge as true seem “dangerously naïve or perhaps even ignorant” in comparison to the onisegun (Hallen Yoruba 299).

While discussing parallels in Nigeria, it is important to note that Campbell S. Momoh (d. 2006) engaged in interviews with elders of the Uchi community.  Momoh says he responded to Hallen’s call for philosophers to go to villages to discuss philosophical topics with illiterate elders (Momoh "African" 99). He cited as his intellectual sources for the methodology of the project not Oruka but instead both Paul Radin and William Abraham. In his 1962 book, Abraham distinguished public philosophy from private philosophy, referring to Griaule’s study of Ogotommeli as an example of “of an individual African philosopher rather than a repository of the public philosophy” (104). Momoh saw a commonality between Radin’s notion of the African intellectual and what Abraham called “private philosophy” (Momoh The Substance 53, 55). Momoh insisted that interviewees should be named and credited.

Momoh was himself involved in interviewing elder sages. He did his dissertation fieldwork in 1978 and submitted his dissertation in 1979 to Indiana University. His dissertation committee included William Abraham and Ivan Karp (An African Conception).  The dissertation includes lengthy sections naming elder interlocutors (such as Aliu Oshiothenaua, Saliu Ikharo and others), paraphrasing their conversation in detail as well as quoting them directly (92-120). Momoh also provides contextual background of the sages’ standing and purpose in their communities (see especially 45-48, 67-70, 85-87). He even mentions seeming interruptions in the discussion, such as the presence of a young boy or a chicken, and how the conversation is shaped by these interactions (something for the most part missing from the interviews in Oruka’s study). Topics focus on metaphysics and ethics. Along with accounts of the elders’ discussions, Momoh includes his interpretation and analysis of what the elders say. While the elders may convey their ideas in story and myths, these do not just reflect communal philosophies since some of the stories are creations of individual men (for example, Ikharo’s story of woman’s refusal to accept marrying man as her God-given duty and role, see 116-117).

In his published work, Momoh names some elders, quotes them verbatim, and gives specific examples of methodological challenges during his interview of them ("African Philosophy" 87-88).  He named Aliu Oshiothenaua, Pa Egbue, Pa Abudah (Momoh’s uncle), and a hunter named A. M. J. Momoh (The Substance 66, 245, 254-55, 376-78). He found in the interview of the hunter a “doctrine of existential gratitude” (The Substance 382). Oshiothenaua asserted a theory of human dependence on nature (The Substance 376). An ethnophilosophical study that merely explored communally held beliefs in the sense of Abraham’s “public philosophy” would be incomplete, Momoh insisted, because “alongside with it” it would need to name individual intellectuals and add additional contextual information such as the time period, cultural paradigm, and branch of philosophy relevant to the discussions. He criticized Bodunrin, who wanted to make an “absolute dichotomy” between ethnophilosophy and the sagacious elders, since, according to Momoh, the latter were based on the former–that is, the “sagacious elders” philosophized in a general context provided by public philosophy ("African" 77-78, 80-81; The Substance 56, 58, 59).

Momoh also insisted that sagacious elders had a better practice than much of contemporary analytic academic philosophy, since their goal was not the narrow one of negatively appraising received ideas, but the broader project of building holistic systems and attending to important moral issues ("African Philosophy" 91; The Substance 69, 75, 78). While Oruka notes that in Momoh’s earlier 1985 article Momoh seemed unaware of Oruka’s sage philosophy project (Oruka, Sage 1990 ed., xxiv) and castigated Oruka as a member of the “African logical neo-positivists” who denigrated ancient African philosophy (Momoh based this estimate on Oruka’s 1972 article critical of myth, see The Substance 64), he later revised his estimate of Oruka and acknowledged his sage philosophy project (The Substance x). In an article originally published in 1987 (included in Sage 1990 ed.), Oruka expressed his agreement with C. S. Momoh’s position that the names of sages interviewed must be given and their views credited to them (Sage 1990 ed., 20). Fayemi Ademola Kazeem considered Momoh to be engaging in a sage philosophy project as was Oruka, noting that Momoh preferred to call it “ancient African philosophy” (Kazeem 196).

Godwin Azenabor included Hallen and Sodipo, Momoh, Oruka and others in a common category of African philosophy which he called the “Purist school” because all were committed to the assertions that Africa has a similar practice of raising philosophical questions and answering them as does the West; however they all saw the need to break free of Western paradigms, conceptual schemes, and conditioning. All in the Purist School emphasized the relevance of African culture and tradition for both philosophy as well as models for African development (Azenabor Understanding xiv). While the choice of “Purist” as a descriptor can be questioned (see Sophie Oluwole’s defense of Oruka’s project as admitting up front the multiple influences on contemporary rural sages, in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 155), Azenabor’s categorization helps us to see the common themes and approaches of authors who emphasized their distinction from and competition with each other.

5. Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages

In some works Oruka was at pains to distinguish “folk sages” and “folk sagacity” (wise elders who could recount community traditions and beliefs but not take a critical, evaluative stance toward them) from “philosophical sages” or “philosophic sagacity” which were the interviews and ideas of particularly reflective and evaluative sages. The distinction copied “first order” and “second order” distinctions in philosophy to a great extent. Many philosophers concluded that the only important part of the sage philosophy project was the “philosophic sagacity” part. However, such an approach left unexplained the role that folk sages played in the project. Why continue to include folk sages if they are examples of unphilosophical individuals? Several scholars addressed this thorny topic (Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria"; Van Hook).

Omedi Ochieng noted the irony that while Oruka first began his project to debunk Western scoffers who thought Africans were involved in unreflective groupthink, his comments championing the philosophic sages as “geniuses” in contrast to folk sages and other Africans who were satisfied at following others and not thinking for themselves ended up reinforcing the negative stereotype of Africans (“Epistemology” 348-351). He thought that Oruka capitulated and accepted academic definitions of philosophy that belittled folk wisdom and championed abstraction in a way that silenced the important contributions of many Africans (“Ideology” 153-57). Oluwole likewise noted that in some of Oruka’s texts he seemed to define “philosophy” so narrowly that even his own sages would fail to meet such narrow criteria, which would ironically lead to the failure of his own project. She insists, however, that if the sage interviews could be approached by sensitive scholars familiar with the sages’ language and context, without the near-ubiquitous prejudice against finding philosophy in African oral practices, that the project in this sense is very promising (Oluwole in Graness and Kresse 158-61).

An additional problem is that even when Oruka sorted out his folk and philosophical sages, the folk sages still demonstrated the intellectual virtues Oruka insisted belonged only to the philosophical sages. To illustrate this point, let me highlight that each of the seven “folk sages” in Sage Philosophy (chap. 6) distinguished their views from those of their communities on at least one topic. Chege Kamau said that he didn’t believe the afterlife consists in ancestral spirits as others believe. Rather, he posited, all people rejoin one big soul, which he called God. Joseph Muthee advocated sometimes unpopular inter-tribal marriages as a means of building a national culture. Ali Mwitani Masero argued that death is the end of the human being. Zacharia Nyandere said he believed men and women were equal, despite Luo perceptions to the contrary. Abel M’Nkabui said all humans were equal, and that inequalities were historical accidents. Based on this conviction, he was critical of Meru prejudice against blacksmiths. Joseph Osuru said that the Teso think that God does not belong to other tribes or races. But he thought that God belongs to all people. He also mentioned that some Teso think that having dreams of the deceased is proof that they live in a world after death. But, he pointed out, having a dream is not proof. Peris Njuhi Muthoni said that it was good that the practice of female circumcision is dying, because it led to medical problems. She stated that it was her conviction that Luo should not remove their teeth as a rite of passage. These concrete examples show that all of the so-called “folk sages” can critique their own societies, an attribute Oruka assigned only to the “philosophic sages.”

Oruka listed “philosophic sages” in their own chapter (chap. 7). The sages included there were Okemba Simiuyu Chaungo, Oruka Rang’inya, Stephen M. Kithanje, Paul Mbuya Akoko, and Chaungo Barasa (Sage 1991 ed., 109-155). An additional aspect of the sage philosophy project was that Oruka did not want the project to stay on the descriptive level. He wanted Kenyans to read and grapple with the ideas of the sages, evaluate them, extend them, and apply them to their lives. However, his own published commentary on the interviews was brief (Trends 64-65). In Sage Philosophy, he left the job of commentary on the interviews to his student, Anthony Oseghare (Sage 1991 ed., 156-160).

D. A. Masolo made the point that it is not mere disagreement with one’s cultural group that makes one a philosophic sage, but rather that “the criterion for a moral ideal, according to the sage, is not that it match the historical belief of the community but that it satisfies an acceptable idea of right, fairness, and respectfulness toward all those who are involved or may be affected by its practical application” (Masolo "Sage"). He gave the example of a sage who would counsel against the practice of a certain ritual if it would jeopardize the health of an individual. In these circumstances, the important criteria “was not their mere variance from the communal beliefs of the sages' own groups but also a theoretical account provided by the sage as the foundation of his or her own view. . . The sage attends to the rationality of views rather than to the judgment of the group” (Masolo "Sage").

One of the tensions found within sage philosophy is that, while Oruka privileged sages critical of their societies’ prejudices, as in the examples above, on the other hand he championed sages who hold in high esteem traditional values forgotten or marginalized by young Kenyans.  In a 1979 research proposal for sage philosophy, he explained that his project was a way of defending his nation from the “invasion by foreign ideas,” which could not be stopped by guns but instead must be combated on the level of ideas. This cultural invasion included worship of technology and an adherence to crass materialism as a measure of success. Oruka bemoaned the fact that African traditional morality was already eroded by European colonialism, and their replacements, Christianity and Islam, he argued, were incapable of standing up to the cultural erosion of values ("The Philosophical").

Oruka often asked questions about the proper relationship between men and women during his interviews with sages. Many of the sages insisted that women were inferior to men. Oruka cautioned readers that the sages were reflecting the cultural prejudices of their times, and he reminded those familiar with Western philosophy that such assertions of women’s inferiority could be found as well throughout the Western canon of well-known and respected philosophers. Still, he was proud of the fact that some of his sages held relatively progressive views on this topic (Sage 1990 ed., xix-xx; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 136), and he even had one sage’s views on the topic published in a Nairobi newspaper (“Paul Mbuya"). The views asserting men’s superiority could be found in the sages interviewed by his student F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo and Ngungi Kathanga. In Oruka’s studies as well as his students’ studies, few women sages were interviewed. Gail Presbey has drawn attention to women sages in her works ("Who"; "Kenyan").

6. Criticisms of Sage Philosophy

From early on, critics from within the community of African philosophy scholars put forward their criticisms. Oruka included three critics (Bodunrin, Kaphagawani, and Keita) and three supporters (Outlaw, Oseghare, and Neugebauer) in Sage Philosophy. Peter Bondunrin said Oruka’s sages were not enough like the Greek philosophers, who expounded their view in a context of literacy (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 163-179, esp. 168-69). Lansana Keita said that when Oruka relegated creative individual thinking to the critical views of “philosophic sagacity,” he failed to acknowledge that the folk or ethnophilosophy of the community could itself be a product of earlier creative individual philosophizing (Sage 1990 ed., 210). While some of these criticisms were perhaps based on a misunderstanding of Oruka’s project (see Bewaji review 109), Oruka did appreciate the debates that ensued and responded to these critics in his own articles, which were included in the first part of the book.

After the publication of the book, criticism continued. D. A. Masolo said the sages Oruka quoted often made comments that were no more than common sense, perhaps with some cleverness thrown in, rather than sustained arguments (Masolo African Philosophy 236-245).  Ochieng’-Odhiambo had a clever and insightful response to this kind of criticism. “The idea that philosophy must always operate at a higher rarefied level with deep abstractions is not always true . . . Philosophy can, in many ways, be expressed very simply”; in fact, he agreed with Christopher Nwondo, who advocated that philosophers in Africa should attempt to write in clear and simple language (Trends 138). But Ochieng’-Odhiambo did clarify that Masolo was not against the sage philosophy project itself, but had just stated that he thought the interviews included were not yet strong enough to prove the point to his liking (Trends 137).

Tunde Bewaji reviewed Sage Philosophy and was impressed by Oruka’s sage interviews because they “reflect a clarity of thought which is not seen in ethnographic, anthropological or sociological studies” (106). While Simiyu Chaungo argued that God was the sun, because without the sun there could be no life, Ali Mwitani Masero, on page 96 of Sage Philosophy, argued that if God created the sun, God cannot also be the sun. Bewaji also commended Osuru’s criticism of popular practices that regarded dreams as evidence about the afterlife. Bewaji pointed out that many persons from so-called civilized societies still consider dreams evidence of another world. He also commended Kithanje for arguing that there could not be many gods, because such gods could not account for the uniformity of creation (106-07).

In chapter four of his book, Philosophy in an African Place, Bruce Janz reflected upon Oruka’s sage philosophy project. He noted that the approach seemed to solve the paradox of African philosophy by appealing to universal principles of reason and exploring the context of African lived experience. Yet, Oruka imported Western philosophical ideas to a large extent and left them mostly unacknowledged.  This was problematic since his project purports to be all about African philosophizing. Additionally, Janz offered critiques of the methodology.  The method at first looked promising, by focusing on conversation between sage and the interviewer (an academically trained philosopher) where the two cooperatively worked toward truth.  Yet, to Janz, it often sounded nevertheless like it was the academic philosopher who focused upon and made manifest the latent reasoning in the sage’s conversation. Janz noted that past, outmoded ethnographies turned Africans into objects of others’ studies and declared that he therefore preferred open-ended conversation. But the structure of questions that most sages were asked in interviews steered them toward certain answers that fit in the context of past Western philosophical paradigms such as asking for an essence (What is wisdom? What is virtue?). Such questions presumed that increasing levels of abstraction were abilities to be praised in a sage. Interviewers guided the sages, he argued, by eliciting the sage’s opinion on topics that the interviewer thought important.  Janz also took Oruka to task for promising to evaluate which of the sages were wise according to an objective criterion. Janz noted the complex and multiple aspects of being a wise person, and suggested that it would not be easy for anyone to sort out the wise from the not-wise. Further, Oruka did not address whether or not wisdom is a culture-bound concept. Janz suggested that wisdom was better recognized intersubjectively, identified in “a process of explicating shared meanings in a community, rather than identifying an essence” (107).

Omedi Ochieng likewise insisted that the sages be placed in a context where their speech could be understood contextually, and he found several places where Oruka failed to fill in important aspects of context. In fact he questioned the “interview” as Oruka’s chosen method, suggesting that sages might not understand an interview as a context in which to justify their philosophical beliefs when challenged by a provocateur. Adversarial debate is a particular form of philosophizing that may not be valued by the sage. But Ochieng did think that interviews with sages in some form should still be done in a “reconstructed” version of African sage philosophy (“Epistemology” 346-47, 359).

Janz similarly suggested that Oruka depended too much on the idea of philosophizing as critique and divergence from communally accepted beliefs. Why not look for other signs of wisdom, such as creative thinking? Janz found many examples of creative thinking among the sages, such as Stephen Kithanje’s “fecund metaphor of God being like heat and cold.” Likewise, Okemba Chaungo showed through his debate of the relative good of wisdom versus land that the seeming contradiction could be overcome by understanding different senses of “good” (109). In general, Janz was frustrated that sage philosophy was not more self-critical about its methods, did not come to terms with its positionality, and did not devote time to critiquing its own methods.

W. J. Ndaba critiqued Oruka’s work, arguing that the ideal of philosophy as “an individual, explicit, critical and self-critical ratiocinative consciousness” was a Western notion, since such emphasis was “counterproductive for the emergence of a genuinely rooted African philosophy” (17). He held that an African perspective would value the folk sage, that is, the person who consulted the wisdom of their community and did not try to do it alone. He referred to the Zulu proverb, Iso—elilodwa—kaliphumeleli (“An eye—when it is one—does not succeed”), to emphasize the importance of consulting other persons who could “note points of detail which elude him or unforeseen snags which turn up to mar his plan” (20-21).  He disagreed with Oruka’s claims that the philosophic sage was more valuable than the folk sage. He did, however, appreciate Oruka’s emphasis on the philosophical sage being able to warn society against holding one-sided or close-minded, ethnocentric views.

While there have been critics of sage philosophy, there have also been many scholars who have appreciated its contribution. In addition to those already mentioned above, substantive treatments of Oruka’s project can be found in the works of Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage); Sophie Oluwole, Muyiwa Falaiye and Ulrich Loelke (in Graness and Kresse), and others.

7. Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages

Oruka was convinced, both by his training in practical philosophy as well as his own sense of values and priorities, that philosophy in general, and the sage philosophy project in particular, had to address itself to the concrete problems facing Kenyans and Africans.  It should address issues in the present and suggest a course of action to make Africa’s future better.. Thus, he wanted his project to be both practical and accessible to a general audience beyond academia. He often wrote for the newspapers, such as the Daily Nation, and other popular publications. In 1986, he participated in a study sponsored by the Institute of African Studies at the University of Nairobi called “Kenya’s Socio-Political Profiles” where he was required to contribute a broad outline of the general beliefs and practices of the Luo ethnic group (Oruka Sage 1990 ed., 53, 58-61). In 1986 he became an expert witness for a now-famous trial often referred to as the S. M. Otieno burial saga. Oruka took the witness stand, and gave an account of the philosophy and practices of burial among those from the Luo ethnic group. He argued that his expertise was due to his study of so many interviews with philosophical sages from the area. He included a transcript of his evidence in court in Sage Philosophy (1990 ed., 65-80).

Note that “culture philosophy,” that is, an account of the prevailing beliefs of an ethnic community, was an offshoot of interviews aimed at discovering philosophic sagacity. In order to see how a particular sage deviated from norms in his individual, critical thinking, the sage often began by recounting reigning shared values in his community. This “offshoot” of sorts (which Oruka had before dismissed in a disparaging way as philosophy only in a broad or even “debased” sense) now became a focus. Some experts in customary law even accused Oruka of giving the court an outdated account of practices, presented as timeless truths of the Luo ethnic group (Cotran 155). When Oruka was in the witness stand, Khaminwa, Wambui Otieno’s lawyer, asked him whether in traditional society there may be people opposed to customs who want to depart from those customs and do things their own way. Oruka explained to Khaminwa that “in a traditional communal society there were very few rebels” (Sage 1990 ed., 70). He minimized the existence and role of such dissent, even though in his academic work on sage philosophy he particularly championed such dissent.

Rather than see him as taking on the role of ethnophilosopher, Ochieng’-Odhiambo suggested that, at that point, Oruka showed that he himself was a philosophic sage able to recount the traditions of his ethnic group while also resolving any inconsistencies (Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 125). Masolo thought that Oruka’s popularity grew because of his role in the trial, due to his ability to unmask the faulty logic of the widow’s defense team that equated “modern” with “Western” in a stereotypical and unfair way ("Sage"). Be that as it may, the court case can also be seen as another missed opportunity for Oruka to champion the rights of women in a male-dominated context (Presbey, 2012, 2013).

The court case was the beginning of a new phase in Oruka’s sage research. As Oruka explained, due to his notoriety in the case, he was offered work sensitizing District Officers and Commissioners to Luo philosophy and customs. When he gave these talks, he reiterated common beliefs among the Luos and quoted individual philosophical sages (Sage 1990 ed., 58-64). He also put his sage sources to use when studying Kenyan beliefs and practices regarding family planning, for the Department of Populations. He had two control groups, non-sages and sages, and gave the views of both. His main point was that Kenyan traditions and values already had the resources for population control through natural family planning.  Further, a sensitive study of the culture of Kenyan people could reveal attitudes and practices that worked against family planning and then point the way to solutions to the problem. Here he seemed to have crossed over quite a bit into the social sciences. Dorothy Munyakho explained that his approach was still considered experimental and controversial from the perspective of people in Population Studies who were more familiar with demographics and statistics than with qualitative analysis of interview content (21).

Critic Didier Kaphagawani, in a 1987 article reprinted in Sage Philosophy, charged sage philosophy with being parasitic on ethnophilosophy, insofar as philosophic sages practiced second-order reflection and analysis of first-order ethnophilosophy (Kaphagawani in Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 181-204). But Oruka responded and clarified. He said instead that philosophic sagacity is second order to culture philosophy. Sages reflect upon the culture, though not as it is summarized in consensus form and analyzed by professional philosophers, theologians, or missionaries (as in ethnophilosophy); rather, they do so based on their first-hand observations of the culture philosophy through their personal experiences in the community (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). This same point could serve as a fine-tuned criticism of Momoh’s terminology mentioned above, since Momoh sometimes referred to ethnophilosophy and communal philosophy without distinction. Momoh added the helpful point that all communal philosophies, not just African communal philosophies, are non-critical, and he gave some examples from Britain (The Substance 59, 63).

In an article, “Sage Philosophy Revisited,” based on a radio interview in 1993 and published posthumously, Oruka noted that some scholars considered his project “just one of the brands of ethnophilosophy,” similar to Mbiti and others, and disagreed with those critics (Practical 183). He agreed that he studied “culture philosophy” and described it as the “beliefs, practices, myths, taboos, and general values of a people” (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). To the end, Oruka trusted his method more than that of ethnophilosophers like Tempels because he based his accounts of culture philosophy on the testimony of trusted indigenous experts (the philosophical sages), and he considered himself to be conveying only what they had told him (Sage 1990 ed., 57; 1991 ed., 43n2). Of course, there is no escaping one’s role in shaping the data insofar as the researcher, even Oruka himself, decides which parts of which interviews to highlight when presenting them to others. This methodological point was raised by Emmanuel Eze regarding Oruka’s work (Eze and Lewis 19).

It’s important to note that as time went on, ethnophilosophy’s staunchest critic, Paulin Hountondji, modified his position.  He reflected on the debate that was started by his criticism of ethnophilosophy and said in 2002 that his earlier rejection of collective thought was excessive. He explained that collective culture must be taken seriously, and that individuality is fashioned from a basic personality, which has rootedness. While he agreed that individual thought should be seen in cultural context, he noted that it should not be stuck there. Roots should not become a “prison house” (The Struggle 128, 151-52, 204-05). Also, one of Hountondji’s biggest complaints about the ethnophilosophers like Tempels was that they were foreigners, or if not foreigners, at least they were writing for a foreign audience, responding to debates and criteria created abroad. Hountondji called this “extroversion,” and wanted instead to have African philosophy being written by Africans and responding to the interests and needs of Africans (“Introduction”). Certainly, the trajectory of Oruka’s interests in the sages showed that over time, the issue of proving anything to outsiders diminished in importance, as the question of how sage wisdom and reflection could help Kenya and Africa took center stage (Ochieng’-Odhiambo "The Tripartite" 21, "The Evolution" 29, and "Philosophic" 78; Kalumba 39-40; Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria").

8. Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years

Oruka intended his sage philosophy project to continue to grow. He called his 1992 book, on former Vice-President of Kenya Jaramogi Oginga Odinga, a continuing study in sage philosophy (Practical 162). In many respects, Oginga Odinga was quite different than the other sages, insofar as he was literate, had formal education and extensive experience in government (being first vice president of Kenya and later a presidential candidate) and had also traveled abroad.  Nevertheless, Oruka insisted that in Oginga Odinga’s role as ker, that is, spiritual and cultural leader of the Luo people, he maintained with the other sages an important commitment to the betterment of his community. Oruka also clarified that, while he had begun his sage philosophy research interviewing illiterate elder sages, because their testimony might soon be lost, he never intended his project to be limited to the illiterate, elderly or rural persons. Thus, speculations that his project would become out of date the more that literacy spread in Africa were based on a misunderstanding of his project (Sage 1990 ed., xviii). Indeed, in Sage Philosophy, he included an interview of one young, educated sage, Chaungo Barasa (a water engineer), due to his wisdom and his commitment to his community (1990 ed., 149-57).

Oruka articulated and emphasized other reasons to continue sage philosophy as a project, including the need for a generation of Kenyans who grew up in cities to remain connected to their roots. He was also concerned with the practical challenges of poverty and corruption and curtailment of liberties in Kenya. He thought that sages, from the obscure rural ones to the more famous ones like Oginga Odinga, could offer a bold moral critique of Kenyan society that could help people improve their lives both individually and as a community and nation.

Oruka’s life was cut short in a road accident in December of 1995. As a pedestrian, he was struck down by a motorist in the streets of Nairobi (Nation Reporter 40). Further studies in sage philosophy have certainly been stymied by this loss but not wholly halted. Anke Graness and Kai Kresse quickly assembled scholars to comment on sage philosophy’s legacy in a memorial book to Oruka that came out shortly after his death, Sagacious Reasoning. A book of essays that Oruka had been working on at the time of his death, Practical Philosophy, was subsequently published. This book divided Oruka’s essays into four sections, one on African philosophy and culture and the other three covering issues of truth and faith, value and ideology, and environmental ethics. Excerpts of sage interviews can be found in some collections on African philosophy (see Oruka’s interview of Paul Mbuya Akoko in Hord and Lee 32-44).

9. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students

To explore the ongoing influence of sage philosophy, it’s best to cast a wide net. While “philosophic sagacity” was a specialized part of sage philosophy, the project also included folk sages and culture philosophy. It makes sense to survey those who found Oruka’s emphasis on the interview process central to their own work in African philosophy. Some of these persons did not mind drawing upon interviews as well as proverbs. Many provided extensive historical background and filled in details of the context of those they interviewed to a far greater extent than Oruka ever did in his studies, and they did so for good methodological reasons. Some refined the interview method beyond Oruka’s own practice, going more in-depth, refraining from misleading questions, and some even preferred participant observation to interview. With all of these variations, it is best to understand these works as influenced by Oruka and perhaps even as improvements on his project, rather than as strict copies.

This survey will begin with those who had been Oruka’s own graduate students. Most published work beyond their original theses and many became scholars in their own right. During Oruka’s time at University of Nairobi, MA and PhD students such as Kenyans Ngungi Kathanga, Oriare Nyarwath, Patrick Dikirr, F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo ("The Significance"), Wairimu Gichohi, and Nigerian Anthony Oseghare  incorporated sage philosophy as a topic and/or interviews with sages into their studies while under Oruka’s supervision. Some of them published articles sharing their research with others. Oseghare’s thesis reiterated many points of Oruka’s own position—holding  a universalist definition of philosophy, limiting investigation to texts that met the philosophical standards of being critical, rigorous and of a second-order activity—and  analyzed three sages according to this criteria. Two of the sages appeared in Oruka’s book, and Oseghare’s commentary on those two sages was excerpted and included in Sage Philosophy. But the thesis included discussion of a third sage, Oigara from the Kisii community. Oseghare liked Oigara best because unlike Oruka Rang’inya (who happened to be Oruka’s father) who explained the psychology behind “explaining events through the activities of spirits as a ploy of encouraging good behavior,” Oigara instead directly appealed to individuals' abilities to make rational judgments (Oseghare xii). Oseghare concluded that the sages met his criteria for philosophical thinking.

Gichohi analyzed the interviews of sages included in Sage Philosophy (1991), finding contradictions in the concepts and positions held by some of the sages regarding their concepts of God.  For starters, she questioned why Paul Mbuya Akoko said there must be one god to account for the orderliness of the universe.  According to Gichohi, Mbuya begged the question, for who is to say that many gods must take on a mischievous character? (89). She also noted that Mbuya said that no one really knows God but later affirmed that God exists and rules nature (91). She noted that Oruka Rang'inya was involved in a contradiction between God being a concept and God's living in the wind (93). She further was concerned that M'Mukindia Kithanje's interpretation of God as present at the biological process of procreation confused the mysterious or marvelous with God (94). When it came to their ideas for the improvement of society, Gichohi found some of the sages' suggestions problematic.  Gichohi was particularly concerned with Mbuya Akoko's suggestion that a criminal should be administered a drug during which time he could be reformed.  She expressed her skepticism that such a procedure would reform the individual.  Since being subjected to such drugs involuntarily is dehumanizing, how could one be reformed while his humanity has been eroded?  In addition, Mbuya did not explain what type of offender and under what circumstance the punishment should be administered.  These are all very important objections to the procedure which were not even questioned during the interview (103-04).  Likewise, when Simiyu said that illness is due to laziness, his view, although perhaps sometimes true, could not count for all cases, such as physical destruction and disease brought on by earthquakes and other large-scale calamities not caused by humans. (131-32).

Ochieng’-Odhiambo described in his thesis and subsequent articles that his efforts were aimed at exploring “philosophic sagacity” to prove to skeptics that Africans can philosophize. For this reason, he explained, “my efforts were channeled toward presenting the thoughts of some sages in an elaborate and rarefied manner. More specifically, I concentrated on those topics that had been the focus of most ancient Greek philosophers” ("The Tripartite" 18). By proceeding in such a way, he would not only “uncoil” the philosophical ideas and logic of the sages but also “show beyond the shadow of a doubt that philosophers existed in traditional Africa” ("The Tripartite" 19). As Ochieng’-Odhiambo explained in a 1997 article that presented some of his 1994 dissertation’s findings, “The rationale of my approach was that if the thoughts of the pre-Socratics are philosophical (and this is never doubted) and if the African (Kenyan) sages think in a similar manner, then they should also be granted the prestige of being philosophical” ("Philosophic" 174). Oruka himself made references to the sages being at least as good as the pre-Socratics (Sage 1990 ed., xv-xvi, xxv, 37), so Ochieng’-Odhiambo was clearly following Oruka’s lead. The rest of the article, based on the research he did for his dissertation, involved interviewing sages and asking them, for example, questions on change and permanence. Ochieng’-Odhiambo asked Rose Ondhewe Odhiambo whether things change or are permanent (in obvious reference to the Parmenides and Heraclitus paradox). She gave a nuanced answer: some things change more than they are permanent, and some are more permanent and change little. Certainly she used reason and put forward a rational view. Ochieng’-Odhiambo went on to interview a man, Naftali Ong’alo, who when asked what the single most important element is, argued that “water is the single most important thing in the universe” (“Philosophic” 175-77).

It’s possible to raise some methodological questions regarding the approach in Ochieng’-Odhaimbo’s early works. The problem of asking “leading questions,” whether pursued intentionally or not, is a real one for any interviewer; Ochieng’-Odhaimbo himself addressed the dangers of leading questions in another work of his (Trends 132-33). While his studies with Oruka were in the 1990s, he continued to address African Philosophy in general, and sage philosophy in particular, as a key topic in his philosophical writings. He gave a thorough account of Oruka’s sage project in his 2002 and 2006 articles, and in his 2010 book (Trends 115-150).

Patrick Maison Dikirr published some findings from his 1994 master’s thesis which he wrote under Oruka’s supervision. Dikirr interviewed Maasai sages on the topic of death. As Dikirr explained, by discussing death, certain ideas, values, or lessons were reinforced about life. There were ambiguous practices among the Maasais, some of which seemed to argue for an idea of the afterlife. For example, when a Maasai person saw a snake (black python or cobra) in a hut of someone who has recently died, they fed it milk, greeted it, and told it, “We are always together!”  After all, the snake may be a deceased important person such as an oloiboni (diviner), a great chief or counselor, or a wealthy man. But Dikirr wondered further, were snakes fed just to avert their anger, so that humans could survive?  Or, were there ethical lessons contained in the treatment of snakes, such as: do not despise strangers who may show up to one’s house? He preferred that these lessons be the real reason behind the stories. Likewise, Maasais thought that waking someone suddenly from deep sleep should be discouraged, because the spirit travels while sleeping. But, Dikirr preferred to understand this practice as a focus on the ethical values of politeness and humility toward others. Dikirr thought the Maasai conception of self was closer to the Aristotelean unitary self-experience. He found evidence to show that Maasais thought there was a permanent end to life. The dead are no longer around. The only thing left after death is how one’s personality affects the children. A person who has children will not easily fade from memory like the single person who dies without children. Here, immortality is understood as a name to remember.

Ngungi Kathanga wrote a master’s thesis on philosophic sagacity at UON in 1992. Seven male (and no female) sages, all Kikuyus from Kirinyaga district, were included in Kathanga’s study. He explained that he originally interviewed fifty women and men (he does not mention how many of the fifty were women), but only the seven men included were judged by him to be sages (96). He included three sages’ responses to questions of men and women’s equality. All three said men were superior to women. All pointed out her physical weakness, and some added other weaknesses. Mwangi Wangu stated that women are unable to keep secrets.  But he said they are respected for their roles as child-bearers, because through the naming of children, the dead survive. Joel Rukenya said women cannot rise up to tough challenges in life, and therefore should not be put in positions of power (122-24). The sages are, however, quoted as supporting racial equality (128-131).

Regarding Oginga Odinga, Peter Ogola Onyango of Moi University claims that a philosophic sage must first become a folk sage before he or she can become a philosophic sage. He then argues that Oginga Odinga proves his ability to be a folk sage by the fact that he is chosen as Ker of the Luo. Ogola Onyango then shows that Oginga Odinga is a philosophic sage because he disagreed with popular opinion of many Luos during the S. M. Otieno burial trial, when he claimed that it is fine for Luos to be buried anywhere in Kenya (240-42).

Oriare Nyarwath analyzed several of Oruka’s sages on the topic of freedom (Nyarwath in Graness and Kresse 211-218). He went on to write a PhD thesis in 2009 on Oruka’s philosophical works which included his review of the sage philosophy project’s purpose and methodology, but he did not include interviews of sages or commentary upon Oruka’s sage interviews (139-161, 247-48). Instead, the thesis focused on the question of Oruka’s commitments and overarching themes throughout his published works.

Also, students at Tangaza College in Nairobi’s Maryknoll Institute of African Studies program were regularly offered a course in sage philosophy, earlier taught by Oruka himself, then by F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo, and later, by Oriare Nyarwath (Maryknoll "Sage Philosophy"). These students continued to interview sages; their reports can be found in the Tangaza College library. In the earlier years, that is, in the 1990s, reports were almost always accompanied by transcripts of the interviews. But after around 2000, the number of student papers containing the transcript of the interviews declined. Either students gave short quotes of the interviews, or they only referred to interviews without giving any direct quotes.

10. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars

Kai Kresse’s book, Philosophising in Mombasa, got its inspiration from Oruka’s project. Kresse explained that he was seeking knowledge about knowledge in the context of the Muslim community living on Kenya's Swahili coast. He wanted to study the self-reflexive, critical knowledge of local thinkers there. His book contained three in-depth portraits of local elder intellectuals and several briefer portraits of younger thinkers.  Kresse explained how his methodology differed from Oruka’s.  Unlike Oruka, Kresse did not center his study on direct questions put to each thinker interviewed, but instead observed the intellectuals during their philosophical discourses with members of their community.  Kresse himself became fluent in Swahili so that he could follow such discussions directly, and read the scholars’ lectures, poetry and other writings. He lived in the Mombasa Old Town community so that he could be socially accepted and therefore placed in situations to hear and document the most interesting discussions. Kresse also helped his readers by describing the historical, religious and cultural context in which the debates occurred, as well as the personal biographies of the participants. But like Oruka and Brenner, Kresse saw a key part of his work as documenting “the utterances of the intellectuals” (31; Brenner). While Kresse added his own interpretation, he provided clear demarcation to his commentary, so that the reader could accept or reject the interpretations offered.

Kresse then followed with several chapters, each focusing on a particular thinker.  Ahmed Sheikh Nabhany had as his goal the preservation of all that was good in Swahili traditions. Through poetry he was able to use his creative skills to communicate the basics of Islamic practices as well as moral guidelines and cultural practices. Nabhany was active in his proposals for preservation of a moral code that was losing ground in contemporary society. In his next chapter Kresse explored Ahmad Nassir, who in his poem “Utenzi wa Mtu ni Utu” summed up a moral code that involved respecting all human beings, that provided guidelines for distinguishing between good and bad actions, and that offered a way to measure moral status. Kresse considered Nassir to be an innovator insofar as he constructed a theory of utu (humaneness) and formulated sub-concepts that enforce utu. The next chapter focused on Sheikh Abdilahi Nassir’s Ramadan lectures. Kresse argued that Abdilahi was a sage, referring to Oruka’s use of the term in the context of his sage philosophy project. Abdulahi’s practice of rethinking his own positions on issues of dire importance to his community, and the extent of his conscious effort to clarify his ideas, made Abdulahi’s practices a clear example of philosophizing (206-07).

Kresse followed the book with an article in 2008 that engaged in a study of the concept of wisdom, based on two Swahili sages. He argued that a person is identified as wise if they are able to make others see the world in a different light or from a new perspective. He argued that wisdom required social performance and interaction ("Can," 194, 199).

Workineh Kelbessa, a philosopher from Ethiopia who had met Oruka and was inspired by his project, used Oruka's interview method to gain knowledge about environmental values among the Oromo of Ethiopia. He wrote a book about his findings. His work drew upon culture philosophy as well as the insights of philosophic sages. He explained, “In this work, the term ‘indigenous environmental ethics’ is used sometimes to refer to the ethical views of philosophic sages who have their own independent views, and in most cases it is used as a plural (of ‘environmental ethic’) to refer to the norms and values of various Oromo groups and of other indigenous peoples” (ch. 1). His objective was to “show how indigenous knowledge systems can serve as a critical resource base for the process of development and a healthy environment.” He cautioned that he did not intend to engage in uncritical, nostalgic acceptance of Oromo indigenous knowledge.  He used various sources, but depended most upon “interviewing, focus group discussion and observation” because they “enable us to understand values and attitudes of the people towards the environment at a level inaccessible to a questionnaire.” He interviewed peasant farmers and pastoralists to learn about their concepts of time and divination, their ecotheology, and their attitudes toward wild animals, forests, and agriculture (ch. 1). His study drew upon many proverbs.

A further sage philosophy study which attempted to apply the insights gained from sage philosophy to the topic of a new national culture for Kenya was written by Chaungo Barasa, who helped Oruka conduct his sage philosophy interviews. Chaungo argued that cultural practices needed to be connected to consistent thoughts and belief systems.  He suggested Kenyans re-examine their lives and cultures in five areas:  the intersection/harmonization of tradition and modernity, death and burial ceremonies, marriage and inheritance, inter-family and clan relations, and leadership and role-modeling.  All of this could be attained with the help of sage philosophy, which encouraged people to pursue wisdom and reflect on their beliefs.  The family taught moral behavior, he noted; however, in Kenya’s modern families (making up about 35 percent of the population) there was, he argued, a lack of morality. “Modern” Kenyans, he wrote, held a flawed concept of modernity, equating it with European culture and religion, and their understanding of that culture was rudimentary and incoherent.  Chaungo maintained that the modern Kenyan also had a stunted understanding of indigenous cultures and traditions; in their place were materialism, and consumerism, and status.  They barely masked their distaste for rural folk and environment, Chaungo argued; yet, they engaged in gender oppression which contradicted modernity.  Also, modern Kenyans were easily manipulated and bought by various politicians.  Such a description showed that philosophical reflection upon tradition was mandatory in order for society to become productive and coherent.

Oral historian E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo’s article “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development:  Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya” (2000) analyzed and evaluated books and pamphlets written by these two sages. Paul Mbuya Akoko, interviewed by Oruka and included in Sage Philosophy, was also a writer.  This article met the two criteria of quoting individual sages, and engaging in critical analysis. Since the sages addressed the topic of development, the thrust of the article also fit in with Oruka’s expressed goals for his sage philosophy project. Mbuya was not the only sage included in Oruka’s Sage Philosophy who had written down his own ideas, and yet Oruka did not analyze the written works of the sages he included in his study.

In his “Conversations with Luo Sages,” D. A. Masolo recorded a conversation of pressing issues of the day in which a sage takes center stage, and in which Masolo was a participant but did not direct the conversation. Masolo considered this an example of participant observation, which, according to some anthropologists, could be a more reliable source of texts for understanding African philosophy than interviews. Masolo included this conversation transcript in his book Self and Community (255-60) because it shed light on contemporary moral debate in Kenya. While not explicitly expressed, what “emerged” during the conversation was the question of whether the worth of abstract moral principles “ought to be judged independently of any real situation” (263). Masolo then further analyzed the issues raised, in the context of moral positions expressed by Kant, Hume, and Wiredu. In another part of the same work, Masolo drew upon the insights of a sage interviewed by Oruka, Paul Mbuya Akoko. He found these to express helpful ideas for grounding the ethics of communalism, described by the sage as, in Masolo’s words, “a norm arrived at for purposes of affecting order in the lives of people by reducing social differences and promoting peace” (50). Masolo could be seen as a contemporary advocate and practitioner of a variant of sage philosophy.  His methods focused not on interviews of a sage by a researcher, but rather the analysis of discourse at various public fora in which the sages gathered, such as “palavers,” public debates and negotiations. In these contexts, sages used their mental skills and were involved in sustained critical inquiry ("Sage Philosophy").

Richard Bell’s book, Understanding African Philosophy, devoted a section to Oruka’s sage philosophy. He wanted to take Oruka’s project further by exploring oral philosophy as an example of narrative and Socratic discourse found not only in the texts of sages but also in everyday discourse and village palavers (32-35, 111-12).). For Bell, philosophy in Africa had to be tied to the experience of the lived reality of Africa, which was made up of the pre-colonial traditions of Africa, and its colonial history, current harsh circumstances, and human struggles (35). Bell analogized to Plato’s dialogues, such as Euthyphro, where, in the context of everyday life, circumstances give rise to philosophical dilemmas.  Sages similarly prompted to engage in discussion as well as deep thought, and they grappled with situations which gave rise to what Bell called the “narrative ‘stuff’ of philosophy” (112).

Bekele Gutema argued that sage philosophy’s method was particularly productive in exploring topics of conflict resolution, such as crises of democracy, problems of ruling elites and corruption, and ethnic strife. Sages emphasized solutions that addressed the needs and perspectives of all parties, having as their goals the harmony between people as well as between people and nature. He added what he knew about elders being involved in reconciliation from his own experience (208-11). Presbey interviewed sages with these themes in mind. She found sages in both Kenya and Ghana who shared their insights into conflict, whether interpersonal or ethnic, and their procedures for bringing estranged parties together. She quoted from her interviews with the sages and evaluated their insights (Presbey “Contemporary African Sages"; “Philosophic Sages"; “Sage Philosophy and Critical Thinking").

Charles Verharen of Howard University engaged in a project which combined Oruka’s sage philosophy project with the methods of Claude Sumner, S.J., the scholar who studied Ethiopian philosophy while living there for 45 years. Verharen noted that Sumner, following the suggestion of Alain Locke, enlisted the aid of linguists and anthropologists to do his philosophical work, something that Oruka did not do, but that Verharen considered essential to his project. Verharen engaged in interviews both among the Oromo and, with the help of Rianna Oelofsen of University of Fort Hare, South Africa, among the Xhosa and San. Verharen explained that he was drawn to study sage philosophy out of concerns for cultural survival as well as philosophy’s survival, as he searched for “better stories to tell” in a world where human survival was jeopardized (83-88). He suggested interviewing both those known as sages and a broader group drawn from all parts of the society, questioning them in such a way as to reveal their level of critical rationality (75-76).

Kazeem likewise suggests that sage philosophy research should continue with slight modifications in order that philosophers can salvage “indigenous epistemologies threatened with extinction” and thereby contribute to a “polycentric global epistemology” (200). Kazeem names his approach “hermeneutico-reconstructionism” and asserts that it can be used to solve Africa’s current problems (200-01).

Oruka’s contribution to the field of African philosophy was substantial, and his influence is ongoing, as sage research continues.

11. References and Further Reading

  • Abraham, W. E. The Mind of Africa. Chicago: U of Chicago P, 1962.
  • Atieno-Odhiambo, E. S. “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development: Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya.” African Philosophy as Cultural Inquiry. Ed Ivan Karp and D. A. Masolo. Bloomington: Indiana UP, 2000. 244–258.  African Systems of Thought.
  • Azenabor, Godwin. "Odera Oruka’s Philosophic Sagacity: Problems and Challenges of Conversation Method in African Philosophy.” Premier Issue. Spec. issue of Thought and Practice: A Journal of the Philosophical Association of Kenya ns 1.1 (June 2009): 69-86.
  • Azenabor, Godwin. Understanding the Problems in African Philosophy. Second Edition. Lagos, Nigeria: First Academic Publishers, 2002.
  • Bell, Richard H. Understanding African Philosophy: A Cross-Cultural Approach to Classical and Contemporary Issues. New York: Routledge, 2002.
  • Bewaji, Tunde. Rev. of Sage Philosophy, ed. H. Odera Oruka. Quest: Philosophical Discussions 7.1 (June 1994): 104-111.
  • Brenner, Louis. West African Sufi: The Religious Heritage and Spiritual Search of Cerno Bokar Saalif Taal. London: C. Hurst, 1984.
  • Chaungo, Barasa. “Narrowing the Gap between Past Practices and Future Thoughts in a Transitional Kenyan Cultural Model, for Sustainable Family Livelihood Security (FLS).” Presbey, et al. Thought and Practice 217–222.
  • Cotran, E. “The Future of Customary Law in Kenya.” The S. M. Otieno Case: Death and Burial in Modern Kenya. Ed. J. B. Ojwang and J. N. K. Mugambi. Kenya: Nairobi UP, 1989. 149-165.
  • Dikirr, Patrick Maison. "The Philosophy and Ethics Concerning Death and Disposal of the Dead Among the Maasai." MA Thesis U of Nairobi, 1994.
  • Donders, J. G. “Don’t Fence Us In: The Liberating Role of Philosophy." 11th Inaugural Lecture. University of Nairobi. 10 March 1977. Nairobi: Joseph Gerard Publication, U of Nairobi, 1977.
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Author Information

Gail M. Presbey
University of Detroit Mercy
U. S. A.

Kwasi Wiredu (1931— )

Kwasi Wiredu is a philosopher from Ghana, who has for decades been involved with a project he terms “conceptual decolonization” in contemporary African systems of thought.  By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two aims.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavory aspects of tribal culture embedded in modern African thought so as to make that thought more viable.  Second, he intends to dislodge unnecessary Western epistemologies that are to be found in African philosophical practices.

In previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topical issue both at the highest theoretical levels and also at the basic level of everyday existence. After African countries attained political liberation, decolonization became an immediate and overwhelming preoccupation.  A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways.  The disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature, and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic conundrums of decolonization.

A central purpose in this article is to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophy in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In this light, it sometimes appears that African philosophy has been quite limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization has been rightly conceived as a vast, global, and trans-disciplinary enterprise.

This analysis involves an examination of both the limitations and immense possibilities of Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization.  First, the article offers a close reading of the theory itself and then locates it within the broader movement of modern African thought.  In several instances, Wiredu’s theory has proved seminal to the advancement of contemporary African philosophical practices.  It is also necessary to be aware of current imperatives of globalization, nationality, and territoriality and how they affect the agency of a theory such as ideological/conceptual decolonization.  Indeed, the notion of decolonization is far more complex than is often assumed.  Consequently, the epistemological resources by which it can be apprehended as a concept, ideology, or process are multiple and diverse.  Lastly, this article, as a whole, represents a reflection on the diversity of the dimensions of decolonization.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Early Beginnings
  3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice
  4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development
  5. An African Reading of Karl Marx
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Kwasi Wiredu is one of Africa’s foremost philosophers, and he has done a great deal to establish the discipline of philosophy, in its contemporary shape, as a credible area of intellection in most parts of the African continent and beyond.  In order to appreciate the conceptual and historical contexts of his work, it is necessary to possess some familiarity with relevant discourses in African studies and history, anthropology, literature and postcolonial theory, particularly those advanced by Edward W. Said, Gayatri Spivak, Homi Bhabha, Abiola Irele and Biodun Jeyifo.  Wiredu’s contribution to the making of modern African thought provides an interesting insight into the processes involved in the formation of postcolonial disciplines and discourses, and it can also be conceived as a counter-articulation to the hegemonic discourses of imperial domination.

 Wiredu, for many decades, was involved with a project he termed conceptual decolonization in contemporary African systems of thought. This term entailed, for Wiredu, a re-examination of current African epistemic foundations in order to accomplish two main objectives.  First, he intended to undermine counter-productive facets of tribal cultures embedded in modern African, thought so as to make this body of thought both more sustainable and more rational.  Second, he intended to deconstruct the unnecessary Western epistemologies which may be found in African philosophical practices.

A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways. In particular, the disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic challenges inherent to decolonization.

It is usually profitable to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophers comparatively (along with other African thinkers who are not professional philosophers) in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In addition to the scholars noted above, the discourse of decolonialization has benefitted from many valuable contributions made by intellectuals such as Frantz Fanon, Leopold Sedar Senghor, Cheikh Anta Diop, and Ngugi wa Thiongo.  In this light, it would appear that African philosophy has been, at certain moments, limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature, postcolonial theory and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization, as Ngugi wa Thiongo, the Kenyan cultural theorist and novelist, notes, must be conceived as a broad, transcontinental, and multidisciplinary venture.

Within the Anglophone contingent of African philosophy, the analytic tradition of British philosophy continues to be dominant.  This discursive hegemony had led an evident degree of parochialism.  This in turn has led to the neglect of many other important intellectual traditions.  For instance, within this Anglophonic sphere, there is not always a systematic interrogation of the limits, excesses and uses of colonialist anthropology in formulating the problematic of identity.  In this regard, the problematic of identity does not only refer to the question of personal agency but more broadly, the challenges of discursive identity.  This shortcoming is not as evident in Francophone traditions of African philosophy, which usually highlight the foundational discursive interactions between anthropology and modern African thought.  Thus, in this instance, there is an opening to other discursive formations necessary for the nurturing a vibrant philosophical practice.  Also, within Anglophone African philosophy, a stringent critique of imperialism and contemporary globalization does not always figure is not always significantly in the substance of the discourse, thereby further underlining the drawbacks of parochialism.  As such, it is necessary for critiques of Wiredu’s corpus to move beyond its ostensible frame to include critiques and discussions of traditions of philosophical practice outside the Anglophone divide of modern African thought (Osha, 2005).  Accordingly, such critiques ought not merely be a celebration of post-structuralist discourses to the detriment of African intellectual traditions.  Instead, they should be, among other things, an exploration of the discursive intimacies between the Anglophone and Francophone traditions of African philosophy.  In addition, an interrogation of other borders of philosophy is required to observe the gains that might accrue to the Anglophone movement of contemporary African philosophy, which, in many ways, has reached a discursive dead-end due to its inability to surmount the intractable problematic of identity, and its endless preoccupation with the question of its origins. These are the sort of interrogations that readings of Wiredu’s work necessitate. Furthermore, a study of Wiredu’s corpus (Osha, 2005) identifies—if only obliquely—the necessity to re-assess the importance of other discourses such as colonialist anthropology and various philosophies of black subjectivity in the formation of the modern African subject.  These are some of the central concerns which appear in Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa (2005).

2. Early Beginnings

Kwasi Wiredu was born in 1931 in Ghana and had his first exposure to philosophy quite early in life.  He read his first couple of books of philosophy in school around 1947 in Kumasi, the capital of Ashanti.  These books were Bernard Bosanquet’s The Essentials of Logic and C.E.M. Joad’s Teach Yourself Philosophy.  Logic, as a branch of philosophy attracted Wiredu because of its affinities to grammar, which he enjoyed.  He was also fond of practical psychology during the formative years of his life.  In 1950, whilst vacationing with his aunt in Accra, the capital of Ghana, he came across another philosophical text which influenced him tremendously.  The text was The Last Days of Socrates which had the following four dialogues by Plato: The Apology, Euthyphro, Meno and Crito. These dialogues were to influence, in a significant way, the final chapter of his first groundbreaking philosophical text, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) which is also dialogic in structure.

He was admitted into the University of Ghana, Legon in 1952, to read philosophy, but before attending he started to study the thought of John Dewey on his own. However, mention must be made of the fact that C. E. M. Joad’s philosophy had a particularly powerful effect on him. Indeed, he employed the name J. E. Joad as his pen-name for a series of political articles he wrote for a national newspaper, The Ashanti Sentinel between 1950 and1951.  At the University of Ghana, he was instructed mainly in Western philosophy and he came to find out about African traditions of thought more or less through his own individual efforts.  He was later to admit that the character of his undergraduate education was to leave his mind a virtual tabula rasa, as far as African philosophy was concerned.  In other words, he had to develop and maintain his interests in African philosophy on his own. One of the first texts of African philosophy that he read was J. B. Danquah’s Akan Doctrine of God: A Fragment of Gold Coast Ethics and Religion.  Undoubtedly, his best friend William Abraham, who went a year before him to Oxford University, must have also influenced the direction of his philosophical research towards African thought.  A passage from an interview explains the issue of his institutional relation to African philosophy:

Prior to 1985, when I was in Africa, I devoted most of my time in almost equal proportions to research in African philosophy and in other areas of philosophy, such as the philosophy of logic, in which not much has, or is generally known to have, been done in African philosophy.  I did not have always to be teaching African philosophy or giving public lectures in African philosophy. There were others who were also competent to teach the subject and give talks in our Department of Philosophy.  But since I came to the United States, I have often been called upon to teach or talk about African philosophy.  I have therefore spent much more time than before researching in that area. This does not mean that I have altogether ignored my earlier interests, for indeed, I continue to teach subjects like (Western) logic and epistemology (Wiredu in Oladiop 2002: 332).

Wiredu began publishing relatively late, but has been exceedingly prolific ever since he started. During the early to mid 1970s, he often published as many as six major papers per year on topics ranging from logic, to epistemology, to African systems of thought, in reputable international journals.  His first major book, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) is truly remarkable for its eclectic range of interests.  Paulin Hountondji, Wiredu’s great contemporary from the Republic of Benin, for many years had to deal with charges that his philosophically impressive corpus lacked ideological content and therefore merit from critics such as Olabiyi Yai (1977).  Hountondji (1983; 2002) in those times of extreme ideologizing, never avoided the required measure of socialist posturing.  Wiredu, on the other hand, not only avoided the lure of socialism but went on to denounce it as an unfit ideology.  Within the context of the socio-political moment of that era, it seemed a reactionary—even injurious—posture to adopt.  Nonetheless, he had not only laid the foundations of his project of conceptual decolonization at the theoretical level but had also begun to explore its various practical implications by his analyses of concepts such as “truth,” and also by his focused critique of some of the more counter-productive impacts of both colonialism and traditional culture.

By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two objectives.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavoury aspects of indigenous traditions embedded in modern African thought so as to make it more viable.  Second, he intends to undermine the unhelpful Western epistemologies to be found in African philosophical traditions. On this important formulation of his he states:

By this I mean the purging of African philosophical thinking of all uncritical assimilation of Western ways of thinking. That, of course, would be only part of the battle won. The other desiderata are the careful study of our own traditional philosophies and the synthesising of any insights obtained from that source with any other insights that might be gained from the intellectual resources of the modern world.  In my opinion, it is only by such a reflective integration of the traditional and the modern that contemporary African philosophers can contribute to the flourishing of our peoples and, ultimately, all other peoples. (Oladipo, 2002: 328)

In spite of his invaluable contributions to modern African thought, it can be argued that Wiredu’s schema falls short as a feasible long term epistemic project.  Due to the hybridity of the postcolonial condition, projects seeking to retrieve the precolonial heritage are bound to be marred at several levels.  It would be an error for Wiredu or advocates of his project of conceptual decolonization to attempt to universalize his theory since, as Ngugi wa Thiongo argues, decolonization is a vast, global enterprise.  Rather, it is safer to read Wiredu’s project as a way of articulating theoretical presence for the de-agentialized and deterritorialized contemporary African subject.  In many ways, his project resembles those of Ngugi wa Thiongo and Cheikh Anta Diop.  Ngugi wa Thiongo advocates cultural and linguistic decolonization on a global scale and his theory has undergone very little transformation since its formulation in the 1960s.  Diop advances a similar set of ideas to Wiredu on the subject of vibrant modern African identities. Wiredu’s project is linked in conceptual terms to the broader project of political decolonization as advanced by liberationist African leaders such as Julius Nyerere, Jomo Kenyatta, Kwame Nkrumah, and Nnamdi Azikiwe.  But what distinguishes the particular complexion of his theory is its links with the Anglo-Saxon analytic tradition. This dimension is important in differentiating his project from those of his equally illustrious contemporaries such as V. Y. Mudimbe and Paulin Hountondji.  In fact, it can be argued that Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization has more similarities with Ngugi wa Thiongo’s ideas regarding African cultural and linguistic agency than Mudimbe’s archeological excavations of African traces in Western historical and anthropological texts.

3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice

In all previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topic of considerable academic interest.  Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization is essentially what defines his attitudes and gestures towards the content of contemporary African thought.  Also it is an insight that is inflected by years of immersion into British analytic philosophy.  Wiredu began his reflections of the nature, legitimate aims, and possible orientations in contemporary African thought not as a result of any particular awareness of the trauma or violence of colonialism or imperialism but by a confrontation with the dilemma of modernity by the reflective (post)colonial African consciousness.  This dialectic origin can be contrasted with those of his contemporaries such as Paulin Hountondji and V. Y. Mudimbe.

Despite criticisms regarding some aspects of his work, in terms of founding a tradition for the practice of modern African philosophy, Wiredu’s contributions have been pivotal. He has also been very consistent in his output and the quality of his reflections regardless of some of their more obvious limitations.

As noted earlier, Wiredu was trained in a particular tradition of Western philosophy: the analytic tradition.  This fact is reflected in his corpus.  A major charge held against him is that his contributions could be made even richer if he had grappled with other relevant discourses: postcolonial theory, African feminisms, contemporary Afrocentric discourses and the global dimensions of projects and discourses of decolonization.

Kwasi Wiredu’s interests and philosophical importance are certainly not limited to conceptual decolonization alone.  He has offered some useful insights on Marxism, mysticism, metaphysics, and the general nature of the philosophical enterprise itself. Although his latter text, Cultural Universals and Particulars has a more Africa-centred orientation, his first book, Philosophy and an African Culture presents a wider range of discursive interests: a vigorous critique of Marxism, reflections on the phenomenon of ideology, analyses of truth and the philosophy of language, among other preoccupations. It is interesting to see how Wiredu weaves together these different preoccupations and also to observe how some of them have endured while others have not.

The volume Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy is an apt summation of Wiredu’s philosophical interests with a decidedly African problematic while his landmark philosophical work, Philosophy and an African Culture, published first in 1980, should serve as a fertile source for more detailed elucidation.

In the second essay of Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy entitled “The Need for Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy”, Wiredu writes that “with an even greater sense of urgency the intervening decade does not seem to have brought any indications of a widespread realization of the need for conceptual decolonisation in African philosophy” (Wiredu, 1995: 23).  The intention at this juncture is to examine some of the ways in which Wiredu has been involved in the daunting task of conceptual decolonization.  Decolonization itself is a problematic exercise because it necessitates the jettisoning of certain conceptual attitudes that inform one’s worldviews.  Secondly, it usually entails an attempt at the retrieval of a more or less fragmented historical heritage.  Decolonization in Fanon’s conception entails this necessity for all colonized peoples and, in addition, it is “a programme of complete disorder” (Fanon, 1963:20).  This understanding is purely political and has therefore, a practical import.  This is not to say that Fanon had no plan for the project of decolonization in the intellectual sphere.  Also associated with this project as it was then conceived was a struggle for the mental liberation of the colonized African peoples.  It was indeed a program of violence in more senses than one.

However, with Wiredu, there isn’t an outright endorsement of violence, as decolonization in this instance amounts to conceptual subversion.  As a logical consequence, it is necessary to stress the difference between Fanon’s conception of decolonization and Wiredu’s.  Fanon is sometimes regarded as belonging to the same philosophical persuasion that harbours figures like Nkrumah, Senghor, Nyerere and Sekou Toure, “the philosopher-kings of early post-independence Africa” (Wiredu,1995:14), as Wiredu calls them.  This is so because they had to live out the various dramas of existence and the struggles for self and collective identity at more or less the same colonial/postcolonial moment.  Those “spiritual uncles” of professional African philosophers were engaged, as Wiredu states, in a strictly political struggle, and whatever philosophical insight they possessed was put at the disposal of this struggle, instead of a merely theoretical endeavour.  Obviously, Fanon was the most astute theoretician of decolonization of the lot.  In addition, for Fanon and the so-called philosopher-kings, decolonization was invested with a pan-African mandate and political appeal.  This crucial difference should be noted alongside what shall soon be demonstrated to be the Wiredu conception of decolonization.  Africans, generally, will have to continue to ponder the entire issue of decolonization as long as unsolved questions of identity remain and the challenges of collective development linger.  This type of challenge was foreseen by Fanon.

The end of colonialism in Africa and other Third World countries did not entail the end of imperialism and the dominance of the metropolitan countries.  Instead, the dynamics of dominance assumed a more complex, if subtle, form.  African economic systems floundered alongside African political institutions, and, as a result, various crises have compounded the seemingly perennial issue of underdevelopment.

A significant portion of post-colonial theory involves the entry of Third World scholars into the Western archive, as it were, with the intention of dislodging the erroneous epistemological assumptions and structures regarding their peoples.  This, arguably, is another variant of decolonization.  Wiredu partakes of this type of activity, but sometimes he carries the program even further.  Accordingly, he affirms:

Until Africa can have a lingua franca, we will have to communicate suitable parts of our work in our multifarious vernaculars, and in other forms of popular discourse, while using the metropolitan languages for international communication. (Wiredu, 1995:20)

This conviction has been a guiding principle with Wiredu for several years.  In fact, it is not merely a conviction; there are several instances within the broad spectrum of his philosophical corpus where he tries to put it into practice.  Two of such attempts are his essays “The Concept of Truth in the Akan Language” and “The Akan Concept of Mind.”  In the first of these articles, Wiredu states “there is no one word in Akan for truth” (Wiredu, 1985:46).  Similarly, he writes, “another linguistic contrast between Akan and English is that there is no word “fact” (Ibid.).  It is necessary to cite the central thesis of the essay; Wiredu writes that he wants “to make a metadoctrinal point which reflection on the African language enables us to see, which is that a theory of truth is not of any real universal significance unless it offers some account of the notion of being so” (Ibid.).

Wiredu’s argument here, needs to be firmer.  In many respects, he is only comparing component parts of the English language with the Akan language and not always with a view to drawing out “any real universal significance” as he says.  The entire approach seems to be irrevocably restrictive.  This is the distinction that lies between an oral culture and a textual one.  Most African intellectuals usually gloss over this difference, even though they may acknowledge it.  The difference is indeed very significant, because of the numerous imponderables that come into play.  Abiola Irele has been able to demonstrate the tremendous significance of orality in the constitution of modern African forms of literary expression.

However, Wiredu is more convincing in his essay “Democracy and Consensus in African Traditional Politics: A Plea for a Non-Party Polity”.  In this essay, Wiredu argues that the:

Ashanti system was a consensual democracy. It was a democracy because government was by the consent, and subject to the control, of the people as expressed through the representatives. It was consensual because, at least, as a rule, that consent was negotiated on the principle of consensus. (By contrast, the majoritarian system might be said to be, in principle, based on consent without consensus.) (Ibid. pp58-59)

When Wiredu broaches the issue of politics and its present and future contexts in postcolonial Africa, then we are compelled to visit a whole range of debates and discourses especially in the social sciences in Africa.  These arearguably more directly concerned with questions pertaining to governance, democracy, and the challenges of contemporary globalization.

Another essay by Wiredu, entitled “The Akan Concept of Mind” is also an attempt of conceptual recontextualization.  Wiredu begins by stating that he is restricting himself to a study of the Akans of Ghana in order “to keep the discussion within reasonable anthropological bounds” (Wiredu, 1983:113).  His objective is a modest but nevertheless important one, since it fits quite well with his entire philosophical project which, as noted, is concerned with ironing out philosophical issues “on independent grounds” and possibly in one’s own language and the metropolitan language bequeathed by the colonial heritage.

It is therefore appropriate to proceed gradually, traversing the problematic interfaces between various languages in search of satisfactory structures of meaning.  The immediate effect is a radical diminishing of the entire concept of African philosophy, a term which under these circumstances would become even more problematic.  The consequence of Wiredu’s position is that to arrive at the essence of African philosophy, it would be necessary to dismantle its monolithic structure to make it more context-bound.  First, Africa as a spatial entity would require further re-drawing of its often problematic geography.  Second, a new thematics to mediate between the general and the particular would have to be found.  Third, the critique of unanimism and ethnophilosophy would be driven into more contested terrains.  These are some of the likely challenges posed by Wiredu’s approach.

Furthermore, in dealing with the traditional Akan conceptual system, or any other, for that matter, it should be borne in mind that what is in contention is “a folk philosophy, a body of originally unwritten ideas preserved in the oral traditions, customs and usages of a people” (Ibid.).

It would be appropriate to examine more closely his article “The Akan Concept of Mind”.  Here, Wiredu enumerates the ways in which the English conception of mind differs markedly from that of the Akan, due in a large part to certain fundamental linguistic dissimilarities.  He also makes the point that “the Akans most certainly do not regard mind as one of the entities that go to constitute a person” (Ibid. 121).  It is significant to note this, but at the same time, it is difficult to imagine the ultimate viability of this approach.  Indeed after reformulating traditional Western philosophical problems to suit African conditions, it remains to be seen how African epistemological claims can be substantiated using the natural and logical procedures available to African systems of thought.  As such, it is possible to argue that this conceptual manoeuvre would eventually degenerate into a dead-end of epistemic nativism.  These are the kinds of issues raised by Wiredu’s project.

As such, inherent in the thrust for complete decolonization is the presence of colonial violence itself.  In addition, there is essentially a latent desire for epistemic violence, as well as difficulties concerning the negotiation of linguistic divides. In the following quotation, for example, Wiredu attempts to demonstrate the significance of some of those differences:

By comparison with the conflation of concepts of mind and soul prevalent in Western philosophy, the Akan separation of the “Okra” from “adwene” suggests a more analytical awareness of the sanctification of human personality. (Ibid.128)

It is necessary to substantiate more rigorously claims such as this because we may also be committing an error in establishing certain troublesome linguistic or philosophical correspondences between two disparate cultures and traditions.

Another crucial, if distressing, feature of decolonization as advanced by Wiredu is that it always has to measure itself up with the colonizing Other, that is, it finds it almost impossible to create its own image so to speak by the employment of autochthonous strategies.  This is not to assert that decolonization always has to avail itself of indigenous procedures, but the very concept of decolonization is in fact concerned with breaking away from imperial structures of dominance in order to express a will to self-identity or presence.  To be sure, the Other is always present, defacing all claims to full presence of the decolonizing subject.  This is a contradictory but inevitable trope within the postcolonial condition.  The Other is always there to present the criteria by which self-identity is adjudged either favourably or unfavourably. There is no getting around the Other as it is introduced in its own latent and covert violence, in the hesitant counter-violence of the decolonizing subject and invariably in the counter-articulations of all projects of decolonization.

4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development

Wiredu’s later attempts at conceptual decolonization have been quite interesting.  An example of such an attempt is the essay “Custom and Morality: A Comparative Analysis of some African and Western Conceptions of Morals.”  He is able to explore at greater length some of the conceptual confusions that arise as a result of the transplantation of Western ideas within an African frame of reference.  This wholesale transference of foreign ideas and conceptual models has caused the occurrence of severe cases of identity crises and, to borrow a more apposite term, colonial mentality.  Indeed, one of the aims of Wiredu’s efforts at conceptual decolonization is to indicate instances of colonial mentality and determine strategies by which they can be minimized.  Accordingly he is quite convincing when he argues that polygamy in a traditional setting amounts to efficient social thinking but is most inappropriate within a modern framework.  In this way, Wiredu is offering a critique of a certain traditional practice that ought to be discarded on account of the demands and realities of a modern economy.

On another level, it appears that Wiredu has not sufficiently interrogated the distance between orality and textuality.  If indeed he has done so, he would be rather more skeptical about the manner in which he thinks he can dislodge certain Western philosophical structures embedded in the African consciousness.

Wiredu has always believed that traditional modes of thought and folk philosophies should be interpreted, clarified, analyzed and subjected to critical evaluation and assimilation (Wiredu, 1980: x).  Also, at the beginning of his philosophical reflections, he puts forth the crucial formulation that there is no reason why the African philosopher “in his philosophical meditations […] should not test formulations in those against intuitions in his own language” (Wiredu, 1980: xi).  And, rather than merely discussing the possibilities for evolving modern traditions in African philosophy, African philosophers should actually begin to do so (Hountondji, 1983).  In carrying out this task, the African philosopher has a few available methodological approaches.  First, he is urged to “acquaint himself with the different philosophies of the different cultures of the world, not to be encylopaedic or eclectic, but with the aim of trying to see how far issues and concepts of universal relevance can be disentangled from the contingencies of culture” (Wiredu, 1980: 31).  He also adds that “the African philosopher has no choice but to conduct his philosophical inquiries in relation to the philosophical writings of other peoples, for his ancestors left him no heritage of philosophical writings” (Wiredu, 1980: 48).  For Wiredu, the use of translations is a fundamental aspect of contemporary African philosophical practices.  However, on the dilemmas of translation in the current age of neoliberalism, it has been noted: “translations are [..] put ‘out of joint.’  However correct or legitimate they may be, and whatever right one may acknowledge them to have, they are all disadjusted, as it were unjust in the gap that affects them.  This gap is within them, to be sure, because their meanings remain necessarily equivocal; next it is in the relation among them and thus their multiplicity, and finally or first of all in the irreducible inadequation to the other language and to the stroke of genius of the event that makes the law, to all the virtualities of the original” (Derrida, 1994:19).  Wiredu does not contemplate the implications of this kind of indictment in his formulations of an approach to African philosophy.  Perhaps the task at hand is simply too important and demanding to cater to such philosophical niceties.  In relation to the kind of philosophical heritage at the disposal of the African philosopher, Wiredu identifies three main strands; “a folk philosophy, a written traditional philosophy and a modern philosophy” (Wiredu, 1980:46).  Wiredu’s approach to questions of this sort is embedded in his general theoretical stance: “It is a function, indeed a duty, of philosophy in any society to examine the intellectual foundations of its culture.  For any such examination to be of any real use, it should take the form of reasoned criticism and, where possible, reconstruction. No other way to philosophical progress is known than through criticism and adaptation” (Wiredu, 1980: 20).

The drive to attain progress is not limited to philosophical discourse alone.  Entire communities and cultures usually aim to improve upon their institutions and practices in order to remain relevant.  Societies can lose the momentum of growth and “various habits of thought and practice can become anachronistic within the context of the development of a given society; but an entire society too can become anachronistic within the context of the whole world if the ways of life within it are predominantly anachronistic.  In the latter case, of course, there is no discarding society; what you do is to modernize it” (Wiredu, 1980:1).  The theme of modernization occurs frequently in Wiredu’s corpus.  He does not fully conceptualize it nor relate it to the various ideological histories it has encountered in the domains of social science, where it became a fully fledged discipline. Modernization, for him, is based on an uncomplicated pragmatism that owes much to Deweyan thought.

This kind of posture, that is, the consistent critique of the retrogression inherent in tradition and its proclivity for the fossilization of culture, is directed at Leopold Sedar Senghor.  On Senghor, he writes, “it is almost as if he has been trying to exemplify in his own thought and discourse the lack of the analytical habit which he has attributed to the biology of the African.  Most seriously of all, Senghor has celebrated the fact our (traditional) mind is of a non-analytical bent; which is very unfortunate, seeing that this mental attribute is more of a limitation than anything else” (Wiredu, 1980:12).  Wiredu’s main criticism of Senghor is one that is always leveled against the latter.  Apart from that charge that Senghor essentializes the concept and ideologies of blackness, he is also charged with defeatism that undermines struggles for liberation and decolonization.  However, Paul Gilroy has unearthed a more sympathetic context in which to read and situate Senghorian thought.  In Gilroy’s reading, an acceptable ideology of blackness emerges from Senghor’s work. And in this way, Wiredu’s critique loses some of its originality.

Senghor is cast as a traditionalist and tradition itself is the subject of a much broader critique.  On some of the drawbacks of tradition Wiredu writes,

it is as true in Africa as anywhere else that logical, mathematical, analytical, experimental procedures are essential in the quest for the knowledge of, and control over, nature and therefore, in any endeavour to improve the condition of man. Our traditional culture was somewhat wanting in this respect and this is largely responsible for the weaknesses of traditional technology, warfare, architecture, medicine….” (Wiredu, 1980: 12) (italics mine)

Sometimes, Wiredu carries his critique of tradition too far as when he advances the view that “traditional medicine is terribly weak in diagnosis and weaker still in pharmacology” (Wiredu, 1980: 12).  In recent times, a major part of Hountondji’s project is to demonstrate that traditional knowledges are not only useful and viable but also the necessity to situate them in appropriate modern contexts.  Hountondji’s latest gesture is curious since both he and Wiredu are supposed to belong to the same philosophic tendency as described by Bodunrin under the rubric of West-led universalism.  However, Wiredu’s attack on tradition is vitiated by his project of conceptual decolonization which, in order to work, requires the recuperation of vital elements in traditional culture.

Wiredu’s stance in relation to modernization and tradition gets refined by his condemnation of some aspects of urban existence which exhibit a manifestation of postmodern environmentalism. First, he writes, “it is quite clear to me that unrestricted industrial urbanization is contrary to any humane culture; it is certainly contrary to our own” (Wiredu, 1980:22). Also, “one of the powerful strains on our extended family system is the very extensive poverty which oppresses out rural populations. Owing to this, people working in the towns and cities are constantly burdened with the financial needs of rural relatives which they usually cannot entirely satisfy”(Wiredu, 1980:22). Contemporary anthropological studies dealing with Africa have dwelt extensively on this phenomenon. The point is, in Africa, forms of sociality exists that can no longer be found in the North Atlantic civilization. If this civilization (the North Atlantic) is characterized by extreme individualism, African forms of social existence on the other hand tend towards the gregarious in which conceptions of generosity, corruption, gratitude, philanthropy, ethnicity  and even justice take on different slightly forms from what obtains within the vastly different North Atlantic context.

Also problematic is Wiredu’s reading of colonialism which is very similar to those of authors such as Ngugi wa Thiongo, Walter Rodney or even Chinua Achebe. In this reading, the colonized is abused, brutalized, silenced and reconstructed against her/his own will.  Colonialism causes the destruction of agency. On de-agentialization, Wiredu states, “any human arrangement is authoritarian if it entails any person being made to do or suffer something against his will, or if it leads to any person being hindered in the development of his own will” (Wiredu, 1980:2).  Homi Bhabha advances the notion of ambivalence to highlight the cultural reciprocities inherent in the entire colonial encounter and structure. This kind of reading of the colonial event has led to a rethinking of colonial theory. But Wiredu’s reading of the colonial encounter is infected by the radical persuasion of early African theorists of decolonization: “The period of colonial struggle was […] a period of cultural affirmation. It was necessary to restore in ourselves our previous confidence which had been so seriously eroded by colonialism. We are still, admittedly, even in post-colonial times, in an era of cultural self-affirmation” (Ibid.59).

5. An African Reading of Karl Marx

Marxist theory and discourse generally provided many African intellectuals with a platform on which to conduct many sociopolitical struggles. In fact, for many African scholars, it served as the only ideological tool. But not all scholars found Marxism acceptable. Wiredu was one of the scholars who has deep reservations about it. But he is not in doubt about the philosophical significance of Marx: “I regard Karl Marx as one of the great philosophers” (Wiredu, 1980:63). Derrida is even more forthcoming on the depth of this significance: “It will always be a fault not to read and reread and discuss Marx- which is to say also a few others- and to go beyond scholarly “reading” or “discussion.” It will be more and more a fault, a failing of theoretical, philosophical, political responsibility” (Derrida, 1994:13). Again, he writes, “the Marxist inheritance was- and still remains, and so it will remain- absolutely and thoroughly determinate. One need not be a Marxist or a communist in order to accept this obvious fact. We all live in a world, some would say a culture, that bears, at an incalculable depth, the mark of this inheritance, whether in a directly visible fashion or not”(Ibid.).

Marxism during era of the Cold War was the major ideological issue and in the present age of neoliberalism it continues to haunt (Derrida’s precise phrase is hauntology) us with its multiple legacies. Wiredu’s critique of Marx and Engels is located within the epoch of the Cold War. But from it, we get a glimpse of not only his political orientation but also his philosophical predilections. For instance, at a point, he claims “the food one eats, the hairstyle one adopts, the amount of money one has, the power one wields- all these and such circumstances are irrelevant from an epistemological point of view” (Wiredu, 1980:66). But Foucault-style analyses have demonstrated that these seemingly marginal activities have a tremendous impact on knowledge/power configurations that are often difficult to ignore. Michel de Certeau has demonstrated these so-called inconsequential acts become significant as gestures of resistance for the benefit of the weak and politically powerless. In his words, “the weak must continually turn to their own ends forces alien to them” (de Certeau 1984: xix). On those specific acts of the weak, he writes, “many everyday practices (talking, reading, moving about, shopping, cooking, etc.) are tactical in character. And so are, more generally, many “ways of operating”: victories of the “weak” over the “strong” (whether the strength be that of powerful people or the violence of things or of an imposed order, etc.), clever tricks, knowing how to get away with things, “hunter’s cunning,” maneuvers, polymorphic simulations, joyful discoveries, poetic  as well as warlike. The Greeks called these “ways of operating” metis (Ibid.). This reading gives an entirely different perspective on acts and themes of resistance as panoptical surveillance in the age of global neoliberalism becomes more totalitarian in nature at specific moments.

As a philosopher versed in analytic philosophy, truth is a primary concern of Wiredu and this concern is incorporated into his analysis of Marxist philosophy. Hence, he identifies the following points, “the cognition of truth is recognized by Engels as the business of philosophy; (2) What is denied is absolute truth, not truth as such; (3) The belief, so finely expressed, in the progressive character of truth; (4) Engels speaks of this process of cognition as the ‘development of science.’ (5) That a consciousness of limitation is a necessary element in all acquired knowledge” (Wiredu,1980:64-65). Wiredu explains that these various Marxian assertions on truth are no different from those of the logician, C. S. Peirce who had expounded them under a formulation he called “fallibilism.” John Dewey also expounded them under the concept of ‘pragmatism’(Ibid.67). So the point here is that some of the main Marxist propositions on truth have parallels in analytic philosophy. Nonetheless, this raises an unsettling question about Marxism and its relation to truth: “How is it that a philosophy which advocates such an admirable doctrine as the humanistic conception of truth tends so often to lead in practice to the suppression of freedom of thought and expression? Is it by accident that this comes to be so? Or is it due to causes internal to the philosophy of Marx and Engels”(Ibid.68). Wiredu demonstrates strong reservations about what Ernest Wamba dia Wamba calls ‘bureaucratic socialism.” Derrida on his part, urges us to distinguish between Marx as a philosopher and the innumerable specters of Marx. In other words, there is a difference between “the dogma machine and the “Marxist” ideological apparatuses (States, parties, cells, unions, and other places of doctrinal production)”(Derrida,1994:13)  and the necessity to treat Marx as a great philosopher. We need to “try to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of classified work” (Ibid.31).  We also need to remember that “he doesn’t belong to the communists, to the Marxists, to the parties, he ought to figure within our great canon of […] political philosophy” (Ibid.31).

Wiredu’s reading of Marxism generally is quite damaging. First, he states, “Engels himself, never perfectly consistent, already compromises his conception of truth with some concessions to absolute truth in Anti-Duhring” (Wiredu, 1980:68). He then makes an even more damaging accusation that a form of authoritarianism lies at the heart of conception of philosophy propagated by Marx and Engels.  On what he considers to a deep-seated confusion in their work, he writes, “Engels recognizes the cognition of truth to be a legitimate business of philosophy and makes a number of excellent points about truth. As soon, however, as one tries to find out what he and Marx conceived philosophy to be like, one is faced with a deep obscurity. The problem resolves round what one may describe as Marx’s conception of philosophy as ideology” (Ibid.70). Here, Wiredu makes the crucial distinction between Marx as a philosopher and the effects of his numerous spectralities and for this reason he offers his most important criticism of his general critique of Marxism. He also accuses Marx of instances of “carelessness in the use of cardinal terms” which he says “may be symptomatic of deep inadequacies of thought”(Ibid.74). This charge, which relates to Marx’s conception of consciousness is indeed serious since it borders on the question of conceptual clarification as advanced by the canon of analytic philosophy. Wiredu argues that Marx and Engels are unclear about their employment of the concept of ideology: “Marx and Engels are […] on the horns of a dilemma. If all philosophical thinking is ideological, then their thinking is ideological and, by their hypothesis, false”(Ibid.76). Wiredu’s insights are very important here: “He and Engels simply assumed for themselves the privilege of exempting their own philosophizing from the ideological theory of ideas”(Ibid.77). Consequently, Marx commits a grave error “in his conception of ideology and its bearing upon philosophy”(Ibid.81).

Another area Wiredu finds Marx and Engels wanting is moral philosophy. In other words, Marx “confused moral philosophy with moralism and assumed rather than argued a moral standpoint”(Ibid.79). Furthermore, he had precious little to say on the nature of the relationship between philosophy and morality. Engels does better on this score as there is a treatment of morality in Anti-Duhring. Nonetheless, Engels is charged with giving “no guidance on the conceptual problems that have perplexed moral philosophers” (Ibi.80). Henceforth, Wiredu becomes increasing dismissive of Marx, Marxism and its followers. First, he writes, “the run-of the-mill Marxists, even less enamoured of philosophical accuracy than their masters, have made the ideological conception of philosophy a battle cry”(Ibid.80). And then he singles out ‘scientific socialism’ which he regards as being unclear in its elaboration and which he typifies as “an amalgam of factual and evaluative elements blended together without regard to categorical stratification”(Ibid.85). In one of his most damaging assessments of Marxism, he declares: “Ideology is the death of philosophy. To the extent to which Marxism, by its own internal incoherences, tends to be transformed into an ideology, to that extent Marxism is a science of the unscientific and a philosophy of the unphilosophic” (Ibid.87).

In sum, Wiredu general attitude towards Marxism is one of condemnation. However, in the contemporary re-evaluations of Marxism a few discursive elements need to be clarified; the inclusion of the demarcation of Cold War and post Cold War assessments of Marxism ought to be employed as an analytical yardstick and also the necessity to sift through the various specters and legacies of Marx as distinct from those of Marxism. This is the kind of reading that Derrida urges us to do and it is also one to which we shall now turn our attention.

Derrida states it is imperative to distinguish between the legacies of Marx and the various spectralities of Marxism. In addition to this distinction we might add another crucial one: analyses of Marxism before and after the fall of the former Soviet Union. Wiredu’s critique is based on the pre-Soviet debacle whilst Derrida’s draws some of his reflections based on the post-Soviet fall. In these two different critiques, we must be careful to always strive to isolate the theoretical elements and insights that bypass short-lived discursive trends and political interests which often tend to vitiate the more profound effects of the works of Karl Marx and those that do not.

The debacle of the former Soviet Union and the apparent hegemony of neoliberal ideology have generated discourses associated with the “ends” of discourse. But Derrida points out that there is nothing new in the contemporary proclamations affirming the end of discourses which are in fact anachronistic when compared to the earlier versions of the same discursive orientation that emerged in the 1950s and which in a vital sense owed a great deal to a certain spirit of Marx: “the eschatological themes of the “end of history,” of the “end of Marxism,” of the “end of philosophy,” of the “ends of man,” of the “last man” and so forth were, in the ‘50s, that is, forty years ago our daily bread. We had this bread of apocalypse in our mouths naturally, already, just as naturally as that which I nicknamed after the fact, in 1980, the “apocalyptic tone in philosophy” (Derrida, 1994:14-15). In a way, in fact the contemporary discourses of endism that draw from the spirit of neoliberal triumphalism, without acknowledging it, are greatly indebted to Marxism and the more constructive critiques of it. Deconstruction, in part, emerged from the necessity to critique the various forms of statist Stalinism, the numerous socio-economic failings of Soviet bureaucracy and the political repression in Hungary. In other words, it emerged partly from the need to organize critiques for degraded forms of socialism.

In speaking about the inheritance of Marx, Derrida also reflects on the injunction associated with it. The task of reflecting on this inheritance and the injunction to which it gives rise is demanding: … “one must filter, sift, criticize, one must sort out several different possibles that inhabit the same injunction. And inhabit it in a contradictory fashion around a secret. If the readability of a legacy were given, natural, transparent, univocal, if it did not call for and at the same time defy interpretation, we would never have anything to inherit from it” (Ibid.16). Derrida’s employment of terms and phrases such “inheritance,” “injunction,” and the “spectrality of the specter” in relation to the legacies of Marx has to do with the question of the genius of Marx: “Whether evil or not, a genius operates, it always resists and defies after the fashion of a spectral thing. The animated work becomes that thing, the Thing that, like an elusive specter, engineers [s’ingenie] a habitation without proper inhabiting, call it is a haunting, of both memory and translation” (Ibid.18).

A work of genius, a masterpiece in addition to giving rise to spectralities also generates legions of imitators and followers. Of the Marxists who came after Marx, Wiredu writes; “I find that Marxists are especially prone to confuse factual with ideological issues. Undoubtedly, the great majority of those who call themselves Marxists do not share the ideology of Marx”(Wiredu,1980:94). In order to transcend the violence and confusion of Marxists who misread Marx, we need “to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of a classified work”(Derrida,1994:31). The work of re-reading Marx, of re-establishing his philosophical value and importance is a task needs to be performed in universities, conferences, colloquia and also in less academic sites and fora.

Within the contemporary cultural moment, new configurations have arisen that were not present during Marx’s day. Indeed, “a set of transformations of all sorts (in particular, techno-scientific-economic-media) exceeds both the traditional givens of the Marxist discourse and those of the liberal discourse opposed to it”(Ibid.70). Also,

Electoral representativity or parliamentary life is not only distorted, as was always the case, by a great number of socio-economic mechanisms, but it is exercised with more and more difficulty in a public space profoundly upset by techno-tele-media apparatuses and by new rhythms of information and communication, by the devices and the speed of forces represented by the latter, but also and consequently by the new modes of appropriation they put to work, by the new structure of the event and of its spectrality that they produce.” (Ibid.79)

Here, the instructive point is that the new information technologies have radically transformed the possibilities of the event and the modes of its production, reception and also interpretation. But there is a far more radical change that has occurred and which signals a profound crisis of global capitalism and the neoliberal ideology that underpins it: “For what must be cried out, at a time when some have the audacity to neo-evangelize in the name of the ideal of liberal democracy that has finally realized itself  as the ideal of human history: never have violence, inequality, exclusion, famine, and thus economic oppression affected as many human beings in the history of the earth and of humanity”(Ibid.85). Also, “never have so many men, women, and children been subjugated, starved, or exterminated on the earth.” (Ibid.)

So Derrida identifies a few new factors that need to be included in the critique of Marxism in the contemporary moment namely the phenomenon of spectralization caused by techno-science and digitalization, the weakening of the practice of liberal democracy and also the crises and multiple contradictions inherent in global capitalism. It is necessary to include another element into the present configuration which is the rise of political Islam as an alternative ideology, its subsequent fervent politicization and its Western reconstruction into an ideology of terror.

Wiredu’s reading of Marx focuses on the conceptual infelicities in the latter’s theorizations of notions such as “ideology,” “consciousness,” and “truth.” Wiredu also criticizes Marx’s project of moral philosophy or in fact the lack of it. On the whole, his reading isn’t complementary. Indeed, it amounts to a dismissal of Marx in spite of the attempt to read him without the obfuscations of innumerable legacies.

6. Conclusion

Arguably, Wiredu’s particular contribution to the debate on the origins, status, problematic and future of contemporary African philosophy resides in his formulations regarding his theory of conceptual decolonization. His approach in formulating this theory of discursive agency and more specifically philosophical practice involves the incorporation of a form bi-culturalism. In other words, his approach entails analyses of the canon of Western philosophy and also the manifestations of tribal cultures as a way of attaining a conceptual synthesis. Indeed, this schema involves a forceful element of bi-culturalism as a matter of logical consequence as well as a high level of [multi] bi-lingual competence. As such, it not only an exercise in conceptual synthesis but it is also a project involving comparative linguistics.

In Anglophone parts of Africa, Wiredu’s experience and research in teaching African philosophy has had a tremendous significance. The positive aspect of this is that the study of African philosophical thought has in positive moments transcended the problematic of identity or what has been termed as the problematic of origins. The less complimentary dimension of this equation is that Wiredu’s discoveries have given rise to (most undoubtedly unwittingly) a somewhat hegemonic school of disciples that is fostering a delimiting academicism and which is contrary to his essential spirit of conceptual inventiveness. As such, it might become necessary not only to critique Wiredu’s corpus but perhaps also Wiredu’s school of disciples which rather than appreciate the originality of his formulations fall instead for the pitfalls of over-ideologization.

Undoubtedly, Wiredu discovered a challenging path in modern African thought in which he sometimes takes the meaning of the existence of African philosophy for granted. In addition, it has been observed that also lacking at some moments in his oeuvre is an attempt to de-totalize and hence particularize the components of what he regards of the foundations of African philosophy.  In other words, African philosophy finds its form, shape and also its conceptual moorings above the discursive platform provided by Western philosophy. In addition, the theoretical space made available for its articulation is derived from the same Western-donated pool of unanimism. Part of recent interrogations of Wiredu’s work includes a questioning of the legitimacy of that space as the only site on which to construct an entire philosophical practice for the alienated, hybrid African consciousness. Oftentimes the question is posed, what are the ways by which the space can be broadened?

Indeed, terms such as reflective integration and due reflection offer the critical spaces for the theoretical articulation of something whose existence has not yet been concretely conceived. So in Wiredu’s corpus we see the very familiar problematic involving the tradition/modernity dichotomy being played out. Finally, it can be argued that this tension is not quite resolved but fortunately it is also a tension that never jeopardizes his philosophical inventiveness. Rather, it seems to animate his reflections in unprecedented ways.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Cronon, D. E. 1955. Black Moses: The Story of Marcus Garvey and the Universal Negro Improvement Association, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cummings, Robert. 1986. “Africa between the Ages” in African Studies Review, Vol. 29, No. 3, September.
  • Diop, Cheikh, Anta, 1974. The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality? Trans. M. Cook, Westport, Conn.: Lawrence Hill.
  • Doortmont, Michel R. 2005 The Pen-Pictures of Modern Africans and African Celebrities by Charles Francis Hutchison,  Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dubow, Saul. 2000 The African National Congress, Johannesburg: Jonathan Ball.
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1994. Specters of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, & the new international, trans. Peggy Kamuf, New York: Routledge.
  • Gates Jr., H. L. 1992. Loose Canons, New York: OxfordUniversity Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1967 Black Skin, White Masks (trans. C. Van Markmann) New York: Grove Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1963 The Wretched of the Earth, London: Penguin.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1974 The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1977 Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans A. M. Sheridan-Smith. London: Allen Lane.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1980 Language, Counter-Memory and Practice. Selected Essays and Interviews. Ed. Donald Bouchard, Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1982 The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1991 “Governmentality” in G. Burchell, C. Gordon and P. Miller, eds, The Foucault Effect.Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. 1983 African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, London: Hutchinson and Co.
  • Hountondji, Paulin.  2002 The Struggle for Meaning: Reflections on Philosophy, Culture and Democracy in Africa, Athens: Ohio University Center for International Studies.
  • Masolo, D.A. 1994 African Philosophy in Search of Identity Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1988 The Invention of Africa Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1994. The Idea of Africa,Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Oladipo,  Olusegun. ed. 2002  The Third Way in African Philosophy:Essays in Honour of Kwasi WireduIbadan: Hope Publications Ltd.
  • Osha, Sanya, 2005 Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa, Dakar: Codesria.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1976 Myth, Literature and the African World Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole,   1988 Art, Dialogue and Outrage Ibadan: New Horn Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1996 The Open Sore of a Continent New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole.  1999 The Burden of Memory, The Muse of Forgiveness New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole. 2000 “Memory, Truth and Healing” in The Politics of Memory, Truth, Healing and Social Justice, eds. I. Amaduime and A. An-Na’im, London: Zed Books
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1972 HomecomingLondon, Ibadan, Lusaka: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1981 Writers in PoliticsNairobi: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1986 Decolonising the MindNairobi: E.A.E.P.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1993 Moving the CentreLondon: James Currey.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Philosophy and an African CultureCambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1980.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1983 “The Akan Concept of Mind” in Ibadan Journal of Humanistic Studies, No. 3.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1985 “The Concept of Truth in Akan Language” in P.O. Bodunrin ed. Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Ile-Ife: University of Ife Press.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. and Gyekye, Kwame. 1992 Persons and Community. Washington, D.C.: The Council for Research in Values and Philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1993 “Canons of Conceptualisation” in The Monist: An International Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry Vol. 76, No. 4 October.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1995 Conceptual Decolonization in African PhilosophyIbadan: Hope Publications.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1996 Cultural Universals and ParticularsBloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Yai, Olabiyi. 1977 “The Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy,” Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.VI, No.2.


Author Information

Sanya Osha
Tshwane University of Technology
South Africa


Cultural diversity has been present in societies for a very long time. In Ancient Greece, there were various small regions with different costumes, traditions, dialects and identities, for example, those from Aetolia, Locris, Doris and Epirus. In the Ottoman Empire, Muslims were the majority, but there were also Christians, Jews, pagan Arabs, and other religious groups. In the 21st century, societies remain culturally diverse, with most countries having a mixture of individuals from different races, linguistic backgrounds, religious affiliations, and so forth. Contemporary political theorists have labeled this phenomenon of the coexistence of different cultures in the same geographical space multiculturalism. That is, one of the meanings of multiculturalism is the coexistence of different cultures.

The term ‘multiculturalism’, however, has not been used only to describe a culturally diverse society, but also to refer to a kind of policy that aims at protecting cultural diversity. Although multiculturalism is a phenomenon with a long history and there have been countries historically that did adopt multicultural policies, like the Ottoman Empire, the systematic study of multiculturalism in philosophy has only flourished in the late twentieth century, when it began to receive special attention, especially from liberal philosophers. The philosophers who initially dedicated more time to the topic were mainly Canadian, but in the 21st century it is a widespread topic in contemporary political philosophy. Before multiculturalism became a topic in political philosophy, most literature in this area focused on topics related to the fair redistribution of resources; conversely, the topic of multiculturalism in the realm of political philosophy highlights the idea that cultural identities are also normatively relevant and that policies ought to take these identities into consideration.

To understand the discussion of multiculturalism in contemporary political philosophy, there are four key topics that should be taken into consideration; these are the meaning of the concept of ‘culture’, the meaning of the concept of ‘multiculturalism’, the debate about justice between cultural groups and the discussion regarding the practical implications of multicultural practices.

Table of Contents

  1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory
    1. The Semiotic Perspective
    2. The Normative Conception
    3. The Societal Conception
    4. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach
    5. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism
  2. The Concept of Multiculturalism
    1. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society
    2. Multiculturalism as a Policy
      1. Multicultural Citizenship
        1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition
        2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism
        3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation
      2. Negative Universalism
        1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism
        2. Kukathas' Libertarianism
  3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism
    1. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals
    2. Women
    3. Children
  4. Animals and Multiculturalism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory

Multiculturalism is before anything else a theory about culture and its value. Hence, to understand what multiculturalism is it is indispensable that the meaning of culture is clarified. In this section, five concepts of culture that are predominant in contemporary political philosophy are outlined: semiotic, normative, societal, economic/rational choice and the anti-essentialist cosmopolitanism conceptions of culture. As Festenstein (2005) points out, these are not competing conceptions of culture, where each selects a distinct set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the right application of the predicate. Contrastingly, all these conceptions of culture defend, even though in slightly different ways, the idea that culture is constitutive of personal identity. Therefore, it is possible to simultaneously defend, say, a semiotic conception of culture and admit that a culture may have normative, societal, economic and cosmopolitan features.

a. The Semiotic Perspective

The semiotic conception of culture was very popular in the 1960s, and has its roots in classic social anthropology. Social anthropologists like Margaret Mead, Levi-Straus and Malinowski considered culture as a set of social systems, symbols, representations and practices of signification held by a certain group. Thus, from this perspective, a culture is defined as a system of ideals or structures of symbolic meaning. Put differently, according to this view, culture should be understood as a symbolic system which in turn is a way of communication which represents the world. This form of communication is based on symbols, underlying structures and beliefs or ideological principles. One of the philosophers endorsing this perspective of culture is Parekh (2005). According to Parekh (2005, p. 139), human life is organized by a historically created system of meaning and significance and in turn this is what we call culture.

Taylor (1994b) who contends that human beings are self-interpreting animals, that is, human beings’ identities depend on the way each individual sees them self, also endorses this viewpoint. These self-understandings necessarily have to have meaning. Hence, the thesis that human beings are self-interpreting animals presupposes that human existence is constituted by meaning. In turn, this implies that human beings are also language animals. By language, what is meant are all modes of expression (music, spoken language, art and so forth) (Taylor, 1994b). To be language animals means that individuals are capable of creating value and meaning, and in Taylor’s view, these meanings have their origins in each individual’s cultural community. That is to say, language is, at least primarily, a result of the interaction of individuals with their own cultural community (Taylor, 1974; 1994b). More precisely, linguistic meanings and self-interpretations have their origins in individuals’ linguistic communities. Thus, culture is a system of symbolic meaning.

Bearing this in mind, it can be argued that the study of culture from the semiotic perspective is the analysis or elucidation of meaning. As in hermeneutics, where the reader has to interpret the meaning of a text, in culture one has to interpret its internal logic (Festenstein, 2005). An example of interpreting the internal logic of a culture could be given by the story told by Quine (1960) regarding the native who says ‘Gavagai!’ whenever he sees a rabbit. Quine (1960) suggests that there may be multiple meanings associated with this actions; it may mean ‘rabbit’, ‘food’, ‘an undetached rabbit-part’, ‘there will be a storm tonight’ (if the native is superstitious) and so forth. The symbolism, sign process or system of meaning underlying this action is what, according to the point of view of semiotics, culture is, and this is what should be studied. In short, it is the study of culture’s autonomous logic.

b. The Normative Conception

The normative conception of culture is usually adopted by communitarians. From this point of view, culture is important because it is what provides beliefs, norms and moral reasons, prompting individuals to act. Hence, part of what a person is includes their moral commitments; their practical identity is made up of these moral commitments, while their reasons to act are motivated by their moral commitments. In other words, according to the normative conception of culture, the term ‘culture’ refers to a group of norms and beliefs that are distinctive and which constitute the practical identify of a group of individuals; thereby, people’s values and commitments result, in part, from culture (Festenstein, 2005, p. 14). By way of illustration, part of what a Christian, a Muslim and a Jew are is constituted by the fact they abide or follow the moral teachings of the Bible, the Quran and the Torah, respectively. Therefore, understanding who one is is about understanding one’s moral commitments and therefore culture is norm-providing. Shachar (2001a, p. 2) is one of the philosophers who endorses this conception of culture. According to her, culture is a world view, both comprehensive and distinguishable, whereby community law is able to be created. To minority groups that have a culture, Shachar (2001a, p.2) attaches the label ‘nomoi communities’. According to her, this term can apply to religious, ethnic, racial, tribal and national groups, for all these groups exhibit the normative dimension required to be classified as a ‘nomoi community’.

The normative conception of culture is usually associated with the semiotic, in the sense that one does not contradict the other; in fact, they may be complementary. For instance, Taylor endorses both perspectives of culture. However, this is not necessary because the system of meaning and significance does not need to provide moral reasons in order to motivate action. From the semiotic perspective, what someone is is not necessarily his or her moral commitments; it can be anything within the system. That is, the system of meaning may be based on anything while, according to the normative conception of culture, culture is strong source of one’s moral commitments.

To explain how the semiotic and normative conceptions of culture can be compatible, consider Taylor’s conception of culture. Taylor considers that individuals are self-interpreting animals. The fact that individuals are thus entails that human existence is constituted by meanings. From the normative point of view, these meanings are moral evaluations/strong evaluations. This refers to the distinctions of worth that individuals make regarding objects of desire. In other words, it is a background of distinctions between things that individuals consider important or worthy and those things which are considered less valuable. From the normative perspective of culture, individuals direct their lives and purposes towards what they consider morally worthwhile. In short, these strong evaluations or moral frameworks are what indicate to individuals what is meaningful and rewarding. That is, they are motivated by these evaluations (Taylor, 1974). Therefore, the self has a moral dimension, in the sense that rationality and identity refer to moral evaluations. Identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is constituted by their self-interpretations, which are ultimately provided by strong evaluations (Taylor, 1974). These moral beliefs or strong evaluations are in turn provided by an individual’s culture–that is why this can be considered a normative conception of culture.

c. The Societal Conception

The societal conception of culture is a concept mainly used by the Canadian philosopher Kymlicka. In order to understand this, it is helpful to consider Kymlicka’s dual typology of the sources of diversity that exist in contemporary societies; for Kymlicka there are two kinds of diversity: polyethnic minorities and national minorities.

Kymlicka uses the term polyethnicity to refer to the kind of diversity resulting from immigration. Polyethnic minorities refer to what is commonly defined as ethnic groups. According to him, polyethnic groups are usually not territorially concentrated; rather they are dispersed around the country to which they migrated. Furthermore, Kymlicka affirms that they do not usually want to be segregated from the culture of the majority; rather they want to integrate with it, demanding policies that give them equal citizenship. For instance, these groups demand language rights, voting rights, places in parliament and so forth. However, even though this demand for equal citizenship is usually what polyethnic groups aspire to, this is not always the case. Kymlicka contends that polyethnic groups can be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal groups (Kymlicka, 2001, pp. 55-58). Liberal polyethnic groups have aspirations that do not go against liberal values, usually aspiring to be integrated into society, demanding policies for equal citizenship. As an example, Kymlicka usually refers to Latin-American immigrants living in the United States, who, in broad terms, make demands for language rights, such as an education curriculum in Spanish.

On the other hand, for Kymlicka, illiberal polyethnic groups are those where the culture and the demands to the state are not in accordance with liberal values. For example, some religious minority ethnic groups advocate the death penalty for gays within their groups; others have gendered and discriminatory norms in relation to divorce and marriage. Some of these groups have demands that are more similar to the ones of national minorities but Kymlicka contends that these cases are the exception, not the rule (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 11-26, 97-99).

Polyethnic groups are not, in Kymlicka’s view, considered a culture; according to him, only nations are a culture. Kymlicka (1995, p. 18) uses the term nation interchangeably with the terms culture, people and societal culture, for example, “I am using ‘a culture’ as synonymous with ‘a nation’ or ‘a people’—that is, as an intergenerational community, more or less institutionally complete, occupying a given territory or homeland, sharing a distinct language and history”. In Kymlicka’s view, national minorities are a group in a society with a societal culture and a smaller number of members than the majority. Hence, a national minority is a societal culture where the amount of members is smaller in number than the amount of members of the majority. For Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) a societal culture is a kind of social setting that provides individuals with meaningful ways of life, both in the public and private sphere. These societal cultures are important mainly because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. More precisely for Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) due to the fact that societal cultures provide meaningful ways of life, they provide the social context that individuals need in order to make their own choices (that is, to be autonomous). Kymlicka’s rationale is that autonomy is only possible in certain social contexts and that social context is set up by societal cultures.

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities or minority societal cultures usually share a number of characteristics. First, national minorities have settled in the country long ago. For example, most of the Amish communities in Pennsylvania settled there in the eighteenth century, as a result of religious persecution in Europe. Aborigines in Australia and many Native American groups in the USA have lived in that territory for a long period. Second, from Kymlicka’s point of view, these groups are often territorially concentrated; for example, Quebec and Catalonia are situated in specific geographic areas of Canada and Spain, respectively. In India, Sikhs are geographically concentrated mostly in the Punjab region. Third, according to Kymlicka, the institutions and practices of these groups provide a full range of human activities; this means that nations are embodied in common economic, political and educational institutions. These institutions are not based only on shared meanings, memories and values but include common practices and procedures. Put differently, nations are institutionally complete in the sense that they encompass a wide institutional elaboration that encompasses a variety of areas of life; they have their own governments, laws, schools and so forth. In Kymlicka’s view, the fourth characteristic that national minorities have in common is that they usually aspire to either total or partial segregation from the larger society. That is, these groups wish to be a totally or partially separate society, with a different state, governed by their own laws and institutions. Hence, national minorities, in Kymlicka’s view, do not want to integrate in the larger society; rather they wish to be able to have a certain degree of autonomy. For example, many Quebecois want to be able to have their own government institutions, run in the way they wish, like schools run in French. Often, the Amish want to be left alone, without intervention from the state in their internal affairs. More precisely, one of the demands of some Amish communities is that they are exempt from the basic educational requirements that other citizens of the USA have to abide by, namely, the minimum literacy requirements. This, as will be explained later on, relates to other set of normative questions about what groups can and cannot impose to their members. In order to address this problem, Kymlicka draws a distinction between practices that can be imposed (external protections) and practices that cannot be imposed (internal restrictions).

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities can further be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal minorities. The former are those whose demands are compatible with liberal values, that is, their demands do not violate individuals’ rights and liberties. Under the concept of liberal national minorities are examples like Quebecois and Catalonians; these national minorities usually demand the right to use a different language in schools and their other institutions, and this does not necessarily violate any liberal value. The concept of illiberal national minorities refers to groups that wish to endorse illiberal values, like the death penalty for gays and lesbians.

d. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach

Rational choice is a theory that aims to explain and predict social behavior. From the viewpoint of rational choice, individuals act self-interestedly when they take into consideration their preferences and the information available. Self-interest means that individuals tend to maximize what is valuable for them. In other words, human behavior is goal-oriented. It is goal oriented by its preferences, that is, individuals act according to their preferences. For instance, if an individual prefers a hot chocolate to a vanilla milkshake or a strawberry milkshake and all the options are available, he will choose hot chocolate (other things being equal).

According to the rational choice view, the information available strongly affects behavior. By way of illustration, if an individual does not know that hot chocolate is available he will not choose it. Thus individuals act according to their self-interest, information and preferences. If a certain person’s preference is to buy the tastiest hot chocolate and this person has the information that the tastiest hot chocolate is sold ina particular store, then this person will act in order to achieve her/his own interest, that is, by going to that store and purchasing it there. Obviously, these actions are limited by the options available and by the actions of others. Therefore, if there is no hot chocolate on the market, this person will not be able to buy it–the option is not available because the suppliers decided not to offer hot chocolate. In this sense, an individual’s are dependent on their circumstances and on the actions of others.

With these premises in mind, a possible definition of culture from a rational choice perspective is provided by Laitin (2007, p. 64), whereby culture is:

an equilibrium in a well-defined set of circumstances in which members of a group sharing in common descent, symbolic practices and/or high levels of interaction—and thereby becoming a cultural group—are able to condition their behavior on common knowledge beliefs about the behavior of all members of the group.

Therefore, there are four key features of this conception of culture. First, a cultural group is a group in which individuals share a certain number of characteristics that differentiate them from other individuals–for example, language or religion. Second, all these individuals share a high degree of common knowledge. What common knowledge means in this context is that the members of a certain culture have shared information and mutual expectations about the actions and beliefs of others in the group. Third, there is a cultural equilibrium when the incentive to act or the self-interest to act is according to the beliefs of his or her own culture. More precisely, a cultural equilibrium occurs when individuals’ have an interest in acting in accordance with the norms and practices of their culture. These norms and practices can be any, but Laitin (2007) provides an insightful example with respect to the old Chinese tradition of foot binding. Laitin explains that it was very difficult for Chinese women to marry a man if they did not engage in the foot binding tradition. In this case, most Chinese parents forced their daughters to engage in this practice owing to the fact that their interest in finding a husband to their daughters was in accordance with the cultural practice of foot binding.  Finally, a well-defined set of circumstances can be described as a kind of situation where the type of interactions that members have with each other are ones of coordination and not conflict. That is, individuals’ actions are ones that are arranged in a way that match or complement each other, rather than being in conflict.

e. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism

The concepts of culture mentioned above have been strongly criticized by some political theorists. Some of these, who direct their criticisms mostly to the semiotic, normative and societal conceptions of culture, argue that these conceptions are essentialist views of culture that inaccurately describe social reality. However, as Festenstein (2005) has pointed out, these criticisms are sometimes misplaced, that is, these conceptions of culture do not necessarily need to be essentialist.

In general terms, from an essentialist point of view, there is a distinction between the essential and accidental properties that the different kinds of objects and subjects may have. Accidental properties are properties that are not necessarily present in all members of a certain group of objects or subjects. Essential properties are those that define the objects or subjects, that is, objects or subjects necessarily need to have these properties in order to be members of a certain group. Furthermore, members of other groups do not have this property or set of properties; otherwise they too would belong to this group. By way of illustration, a bookshelf in order to be a bookshelf has to necessarily be constructed in a way that makes it possible to hold books–this is its essential property. The fact that a specific bookshelf is brown, black or blue is an accidental property–it does not change what the object is and it is indifferent to its definition. These properties are necessary and sufficient not only to include a certain object or subject in the group but also to exclude any object or subject which does not share these properties. Bearing this in mind, it can be concluded that essences are given by differences and similarities; for what defines a subject is what it has in common with the subjects of the same group, which in turn is a characteristic that other groups do not have.

In terms of what this means to culture, it means identifying the social characteristics or attributes that make the group what it is, and that all members of that group necessarily share. Moreover, these characteristics are what differentiate members of that group from others and clearly exclude others (Young, 2000a, p. 87). For example, for an essentialist, to classify Muslims as Muslims means to identify a certain characteristic, like shared practices and beliefs, common to all of the individuals who identify as Muslims. Thus, essentialism applied to culture would be that a certain culture means having a certain characteristic or set of characteristics that all members share, and which no one outside the group does. Hence, from this point of view, the identity of the group is constituted by the set of properties or attributes which are essential to this particular group (Young, 2000a).

According to the critics of essentialism, this theory necessarily makes two wrong assumptions about culture. First, the critics state that essentialists wrongly affirm that cultures are clearly demarcated wholes and their practices and beliefs do not overlap with other cultures. Thus, according to this argument, essentialists wrongly affirm that beliefs and practices are exclusive to each culture. This premise is necessary for defending essentialism because from an essentialist point of view; different groups cannot share the same essential properties; otherwise they would belong to the same group. Second, essentialists, according to these critics, wrongly picture cultures as internally uniform or homogeneous. Put differently, essentialists consider that individuals with the same culture all agree and interpret practices in the same way. Furthermore, they all place the same value on the practices of the group. This second premise is necessary for essentialist thinking owing to the fact that a group has to have a property or a set of properties that is predicated of all individuals in order for them to be members of this group.

This essentialist perspective of culture has however been widely contested. The general argument is that essentialism stereotypes and makes abusive generalizations of what groups are. That is to say, according to the critics, essentialism is descriptively inaccurate. Criticism of this perspective contends that the first premise lacks empirical evidence. There is no evidence that there is any exclusivity in terms of practices and beliefs, in fact, evidence suggests the opposite; cultures borrow practices and beliefs in order to increase their fitness. Cultures are not bounded, owing to the fact that culture is constantly changing, influenced by local, national and global resources (Phillips, 2007a; 2010). Hence, according to this view, it is not possible to clearly demarcate the boundaries of cultures because they share a number of practices and beliefs. There is significant overlapping of cultures, especially in neighboring cultures. The distinction between cultures is, therefore, overemphasized–the boundaries between cultures not being clearly demarcated (Benhabib, 2002; Phillips, 2007a).

With regards to the second premise, the criticism contends that it is false to say that there is internal homogeneity inside a group in terms of needs, interests and beliefs. Rather, the social actors of cultural groups have different needs, interests and interpretations about the beliefs and practices of groups. Furthermore, in many cases, they consider these practices and beliefs quite contestable, discussable and open to different interpretations. Therefore, there is wide disagreement about cultural meaning (Benhabib, 2002). Anti-essentialists contend that there are too many exceptions to make essentialist claims. Therefore, there are a considerable number of counter-examples to this generalization (Phillips, 2007a; 2010; Schachar, 2001a). As a consequence, some anti-essentialists usually argue that these categories should be substituted by thinner categories. Thus, rather than speaking about women, one should speak about black women, or lesbian Muslim women.

Taking this into consideration, different, more flexible conceptions of culture have been suggested; perhaps the most well-known being the cosmopolitan conception of culture, defended by Waldron. In Waldron’s view, cultures are dynamic and in continuous creation and interchange (Waldron, 1991). Consequently, cultures overlap with each other, making it impossible to attribute exclusive properties to one single culture and to differentiate between them. In other words, according to this view, there is a mélange of cultures because people move between cultures by enjoying the opportunities that each provides. Hence, individuals live in a kaleidoscope of cultures, within which they enjoy and borrow practices (Waldron, 1996).

A question that arises is whether this criticism entails that any attempt to define culture is mistaken. Some anti-essentialists like Narayan (1998) contend that this is not the case. Rather, she contends that cultures can be defined if two points are taken into consideration. First, cultures are fluid and constantly changing; hence, any definition of culture should consider that cultures are always in flux. Second, broader categories should be substituted by thinner categories. This means that rather than using terms like ‘African Culture’, one should use terms like ’Tutsi culture in Rwanda’.

2. The Concept of Multiculturalism

In general terms, within contemporary political philosophy, the concept of multiculturalism has been defined in two different ways. Sometimes the term ‘multiculturalism’ is used as a descriptive concept; other times it is defined as a kind of policy for responding to cultural diversity. In the next section, the definition of multiculturalism as a descriptive concept will be explained, followed by a clarification of what it means to use the term ‘multiculturalism’ as a policy.

a. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society

The term ‘multiculturalism’ is sometimes used to describe a condition of society; more precisely, it is used to describe a society where a variety of different cultures coexist. Many countries in the world are culturally diverse. Canada is just one example, including a variety of cultures such as English Canadians, Quebecois, Native Americans, Amish, Hutterites and Chinese immigrants. China is another country that can also be considered culturally diverse. In contemporary China, there are 56 officially recognized ethnic groups, and 55 of these groups are ethnic minorities who make up approximately 8.41 percent of China’s overall population. The other ethnic group is that of Han Chinese, which holds majority status (Han, 2013; He, 2006).

There are a variety of ways whereby societies can be diverse, for example, culture can come in many forms (Gurr, 1993, p. 3). Perhaps the chief ways in which a country can be culturally diverse is by having different religious groups, different linguistic groups, groups that define themselves by their territorial identity and variant racial groups.

Religious diversity is a widespread phenomenon in many countries. India can be given as an example of a country which is religiously diverse, including citizens who are Sikhs, Hindus, Buddhists, among other religious groups. The US is also religiously diverse, including Mormons, Amish, Hutterites, Catholics, Jews and so forth. These groups differentiate from each other via a variety of factors. Some of these are the Gods worshiped, the public holidays, the religious festivals and the dress codes.

Linguistic diversity is also widespread. In the 21st century, there are more than 200 countries in the world and around 6000 spoken languages (Laitin, 2007). Linguistic diversity usually results from two kinds of groups. First, it results from immigrants who move to a country where the language spoken is not their native language (Kymlicka, 1995). This is the case for those Cubans and Puerto Ricans who immigrated to the United States; it is also the case for Ukrainian immigrants who moved to Portugal.

The second kind of groups that are a cause of linguistic diversity are national minorities. National minorities are groups that have either settled in the country for a long time, but do not share the same language with the majority. Some examples include Quebecois in Canada, Catalans and Basques in Spain, and the Uyghur in China. Usually, these linguistic groups are territorially concentrated; furthermore, minority groups that fall into this category usually demand a high degree of autonomy. In particular, minority groups usually demand that they have the regional power to self-govern, that is, to run their territory as if it was an independent country or to succeed and become a different country.

A third kind of group diversity can results from distinct territory location. This territory location does not necessary mean that members of distinct cultures are, in fact, different. That is, it is not necessary that habits, traditions, customs, and so forth are significantly different. However, these distinct groups identify themselves as different from others because of the specific geographical area in which they are located. Possibly, in the UK, this is what distinguishes Scots from English. Even though there are historical differences between Scots and English, if one assumes that these two groups have little to distinguish themselves from each other, other than their geographical location, they would fit this third kind of group diversity. As mentioned above, these differences are conceptual and, in practice, cultural groups are characterized by a variety of features and not just one.

The fourth kind of group diversity is race. Races are groups whose physical characteristics are imbued with social significance. In other words, race is a socially constructed concept in the sense that it is the result of individuals giving social significance to a set of characteristics they consider that stand out in a person's physical appearance, such as skin color, eye color, hair color, bone/jaw structure and so forth. However, the mere existence of different physical characteristics does not mean that there is a multicultural environment/society. For instance, it cannot be affirmed that Sweden is multicultural because there are Swedes with blue eyes and others with green. Physical characteristics create a multicultural environment only when these physical characteristics mean that groups strongly identify with their physical characteristics and where these physical characteristics are socially perceived as something that strongly differentiates them from other groups. That is, racial cultural diversity is not simply the existence of different physical characteristics. Rather, these different physical characteristics must entail a sense of common identity which, in turn, are socially perceived as something that differentiates the members of that group to others. However, many times this idea of common identity is exaggerated, as Waldron’s argument suggests. For instance, even though there is the idea that a black culture exists in the United States, Appiah (1996) denies that such black culture exists, since there is no common identity among blacks in the United States. An example of a physical difference that is considered socially significant and, therefore, creates a multicultural society/environment can be seen in the Tutsis and Hutus of Rwanda. In general terms, Tutsis and Hutus are very similar, due to the fact that they speak the same language, share the same territory and follow the same traditions. Nevertheless, Tutsis are usually taller and thinner than Hutus. The social significance given to these physical differences are sufficient for members of both groups, broadly speaking, to identify as members of one group or the other, and subsequently oppose to each other.

Obviously, groups are not, most of the time, identified only by being linguistically different, territorially concentrated or religiously distinct. In fact, most groups have more than one of these characteristics. For instance, Sikhs in India, besides being religiously different, are also characterized, in general terms, by their geographical location. Namely, they are localized in the Punjab region of India. The Uyghur, from China, have a different language, are usually Muslims and are usually located in Xinjiang. Thus, the classification is helpful for understanding the characteristics of each group, but does not mean that these groups are simply defined by that characteristic.

b. Multiculturalism as a Policy

The term ‘multiculturalism’ can also be used to refer to a kind of policy. This kind of policy has two main characteristics. First, it aims at addressing the different demands of cultural groups. That is, it is a kind of policy that refers to the different normative challenges (ethnic conflict, internal illiberalism, federal autonomy, and so forth) that arise as a result of cultural diversity. For example, these are policies that aim at addressing the different normative challenges that arise from minority groups, like Quebecois, wishing to have their own institutions in a different language from the rest of Canada. To contrast with redistributive policies, multicultural policies are not primarily about distributive justice, that is, who gets what share of resources, although multicultural policies may refer to redistribution accidentally (Fraser, 2001). Multicultural policies aim at correcting the kind of disadvantages that some individuals are victims of, and that result from these individuals’ cultural identity. For instance, these are policies that aim at correcting a disadvantage that may result from someone being a member of a certain religion. In the case of some Muslims, this can mean addressing the problem of Muslims living in a Christian country and demanding different public holidays than the majority to celebrate their own festivals such as Eid-al-Fitr.

Second, multicultural policies are policies that aim at providing groups the means by which individuals can pursue their cultural differences. Put differently, multicultural policies have as their objectives, the preservation, allowance or celebration of differences between different groups. Consequently, multicultural policies contrast with assimilation. That is, according to the assimilationist view, it is acceptable that people are different, but the final goal of policies should be to make the minority group become part of the majority group, that is, to be accepted by those in the majority group, and to somehow find a consensus position between different cultures. Contrastingly, multiculturalism acknowledges that people have different ways of life and, in general terms, the state ought not to assimilate these groups but to give them the tools for pursuing their own ways of life or culture. That is, from a multiculturalist point of view, the final objective of policies is neither the standardization of cultural forms nor any form of uniformity or homogeneity; rather, its objective is to allow and give the means for groups to pursue their differences.

According to Kymlicka, in the context of contemporary liberal political philosophy, there have been two waves of writings on multiculturalism (Kymlicka, 1999a). This discussion of what policies ought to be undertaken in order to protect minority cultures is included in what Kymlicka called the first wave of the wave of writings on multiculturalism. In his view (1999a, p. 112), the first wave of writing focused on assessing to what extent it is just, from a liberal point of view, to give rights to groups so that they can pursue their cultural differences. In this first wave of writings, contemporary liberal political philosophers have discussed what kind of inequalities exist between majorities and minorities, and how these should be addressed. In other words, the discussion has been about what kind of intergroup inequalities exist, and what the state should do about them. In general terms, contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written about this topic have taken two different stands. On the one hand, some liberal political philosophers defend that state institutions should be blind to difference and that individuals should be given a uniform set of rights and liberties. In these authors’ views, cultural diversity, religious freedom and so forth are sufficiently protected by these sets of rights and liberties, especially by freedom of association and conscience. Therefore, those who stand for a uniform set of rights and liberties contend that ascribing rights on the basis of membership in a group is a discriminatory and immoral policy that creates citizenship hierarchies that are undesirable and unjust (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-113). Thus, in the view of these contemporary liberal philosophers, involvement in the cultural character of society is something that the state is under the duty to not do.

On the other hand, some philosophers have taken the opposite view on this matter. For example, there are some contemporary liberal political philosophers who are more sympathetic to the idea of ascribing rights to groups and have defended difference-sensitive policies. As Kymlicka (1999a, p. 112) points out, these contemporary liberal political philosophers have tried to show that difference-sensitive rules are not inherently unjust. In general terms, these contemporary political philosophers argue that a regime of difference-sensitive policies does not necessarily entail a hierarchization of citizenship and unfair privileges for some groups. Rather, they argue that difference-sensitive policies aim at correcting intergroup inequalities and disadvantages in the cultural market. Moreover, some of these philosophers contend that difference-blind policies favor the needs, interests and identities of the majority (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-114). These philosophers who consider that groups are entitled to special rights can be classified as a form of multicultural citizenship.

Those who defend special rights for groups have suggested a variety of policies. In his book The Multiculturalism of Fear, Levy (2000, pp. 125-160) systematically exposed the kinds of difference-sensitive policies that are usually discussed in the literature. According to him, difference-sensitive policies can be divided into eight categories: exemptions, assistance, symbolic claims, recognition/enforcement, special representation, self-government, external rules and internal rules.

Exemptions to laws are usually rights based on a negative liberty of non-interference from the state in a specific affair, which would cause a significant burden to a certain group. Or, to put it another way, exemptions to the law happen when the state abstains from interfering with or obliging a certain group who desire to practice something in order to diminish their burden. Exemptions can also be a limitation of someone else’s liberty to impose some costs on a certain group. Imagine that there is a general law that decrees corporations have the right to impose a dress code upon their employees. However, having this general law would burden those groups for whom dressing in a certain manner (that is, different from the one required by the company) is a very important value. For example, for many Sikh men and Muslim women it is very important to wear turbans and headscarves, respectively. Hence, it can be claimed that giving these individuals the option of either finding another job or rejecting their dress code can be a significant burden to them; given that the choice of dressing in a certain way is sometimes much harder for Sikh men and Muslim women than for a Westerner, and that it would undermine their identity, an exemption may be justified (Levy, 2000, pp. 128-133). Hence, these groups would be able to engage in practices that are not allowable for the majority of citizens.

Assistance rights aim to aid individuals in overcoming the obstacles they face because they belong to a certain group. In other words, assistance rights aim to rectify disadvantages experienced by certain individuals, as a result of their membership of a certain group, when compared to the majority. This can mean funding individuals to pursue their goals or using positive discrimination to help them in a variety of ways. Language rights are an example of this approach. Suppose that some individuals from Catalonia cannot speak Spanish. An assistance measure would be having people speak both Spanish and Catalan at public institutions, so that they can serve people from the minority as well the minority language group. Another example would be awarding subsidies to help groups preserve their cohesion by maintaining their practices and beliefs, and by allowing individuals from a minority to participate in public institutions as full citizens. Most of these practices are temporary, but they do not need to be (language rights, for example, are often not temporary) (Levy, 2000, pp. 133-137).

Symbolic claims refer to problems which do not affect individuals’ lives directly or seriously, but which may make the relations between individuals from different groups better. In a multicultural country, where there are multiple religions, ethnicities and ways of life, it may not make sense to have certain symbols that represent only a specific culture. Symbolic claims are ones that require, on the grounds of equality, the inclusion of all the cultures in a specific country in that country’s symbols. An example would be including Catholic, Sikh, Muslim, Protestant, Welsh, Northern Irish, Scottish, and English symbols on both the British flag and in the national anthem. Not integrating minority symbols may be considered as dispensing a lack of respect and unequal treatment to minorities.

Recognition is a demand for integrating a specific law or cultural practice into the larger society. If individuals want to integrate a specific law, they can ask for the law to become part of the major legal system. Hence, Sharia law could form part of divorce law for Muslims, while Aboriginal law could run in conjunction with Australian property rights law. It could also be a requirement to include certain groups in the history books used in schools–for example, to include the history of Indian and Pakistani immigrants in British history textbooks. Failing to integrate this law may bring a substantive burden to bear on individuals’ identity. In the Muslim case, because family law is of crucial importance to their identity, they may be considerably burdened by having to abide by a Western perspective of divorce. With regards to Aboriginal law, because hunting is essential for their way of life, if other individuals own the(ir) land this may undermine the Aboriginal culture.

Special representation rights are designed to protect groups which have been systematically unrepresented and disadvantaged in the larger society. Minority groups may be under-represented in the institutions of a society, and in order to place them in a position of equal bargaining power, it is necessary to provide special rights to the members of these groups. Hence, these rights aim to defend individuals’ interests in a more equal manner by guaranteeing some privileges or preventing discrimination. One way to achieve this is by setting aside extra seats for minorities in parliament (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 131-152; Levy, 2000, pp. 150-154).

Self-government rights are usually what are claimed by national minorities (for example, Pueblo Indians and Quebecois) and they usually demand some degree of autonomy and self-determination. This sometimes implies demands for exclusive occupation of land and territorial jurisdiction. The reason groups sometimes may need these rights is that the kind of autonomy they give is a necessary condition by which individuals can develop their cultures, which is in the best interest of a culture’s members. More precisely, a specific educational curriculum, language right or jurisdiction over a territory may be a necessary requirement for the survival and prosperity of a particular culture and its members. This is compatible with both freedom and equality; it is compatible with freedom because it allows individuals access to their culture and to make their own choices; it is consistent with equality because it places individuals on an equal footing in terms of cultural access (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 27-30; Levy, 2000, pp. 137- 138).

What Levy classifies as external rules can be considered as kinds of rights for self-government. They involve restricting other people’s freedom in order to preserve a certain culture. Hence, Aborigines in Australia employ external safeguards to protect their land. For example, freedom of movement is limited to outsiders who circulate in Aboriginal territory; furthermore, outsiders do not have the right to buy Aboriginal land. Demands that groups make for internal rules are those demands that aim at restricting individuals’ behavior within the group. Stigmatizing, ostracizing or excommunicating individuals from groups because they have not abided by the rules is what is usually meant by internal rules. Thus, this is the power given to groups to treat their members in a way that is not acceptable for the rest of society. An example can be if a certain individual marries someone from another group, which may then mean he is expelled from his own group. Another case is that of the Amish who want their children to withdraw from school earlier than the rest of society. In contrast to external rules, the restrictions on freedom apply to members of the group and not to outsiders. It is controversial whether internal rules are compatible with liberal values or not. On the one hand, authors like Kymlicka affirm they are not, because they undermine individuals’ autonomy, which is, in his view, a central liberal value. On the other hand, philosophers like Kukathas contend that liberals are committed to tolerance and, thereby, should accept some internal restrictions.

i. Multicultural Citizenship

Generally speaking, the philosophy of those authors who defend a multicultural citizenship, have five points in common. Firstly, they all contend that the state has the duty to support laws which defend the basic legal, civil and political rights of its citizens. Secondly, they argue that the state should participate in the construction of societal cultural character, thus its laws and policies should aim to protect culture. Thirdly, these philosophers contend that the character of culture is normative. Consequently, and this is the fourth common feature, individuals’ interest in culture is sufficiently strong enough that it needs to be supported by the state. Fifth, they both defend difference-sensitive/multicultural citizenship policies for protecting culture. Some of the philosophers who defend a multicultural citizenship are Taylor, Kymlicka and Shachar.

1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition

According to Taylor, there are two forms of recognition; intimate recognition and public recognition. Taylor (1994b, p. 37) mainly discusses the idea of public recognition or recognition in the public sphere. This form of recognition is about respect and esteem for one’s identity in the public realm; being misrecognized in the public realm means to have one’s identity disrespected in a way whereby one is treated as a second-class citizen. Being misrecognized, in this sense, is to have an unequal citizenship status in virtue of one’s identity. Hence, someone is misrecognized in the public sphere if one has a legal disadvantage that results from one’s identity. To have respect and esteem for someone in the public sphere means to have citizenship rights that do not disadvantage one’s identity. In Taylor’s view, misrecognition can potentially be a form of oppression and helps to create self-hating images in those who are misrecognized. Bearing this in mind, recognition is a vital human need because the relation between recognition and identity (the way people understand who they are) is relatively strong; hence, misrecognition or non-recognition may have a serious harmful effect on individuals

In order to discuss the best way to achieve recognition in the public realm, Taylor draws a distinction between procedural and non-procedural forms of liberalism. He affirms that, according to the procedural version of liberalism, a just society is one where all individuals have a uniform set of rights and freedoms, and having different rights for different people creates distinctions between first-class and second-class citizens: this liberalism is only committed to individual rights and rejects the idea of collective rights. The state, according to this version of liberalism, should not be involved in the cultural character of society and the procedures of this society must be independent of any particular set of values held by the citizens of that polity. In other words, the state should be neutral and independent of any conception of the good life.

In Taylor’s (1994b, p. 60) view, procedural liberalism is inhospitable to difference and is unable to accommodate different cultures. Taylor believes that, in some cases, collective goals need to be aided so that they can be achieved. Sometimes cultural communities need to have power over certain jurisdictions so that they can promote their own culture; this is something that a procedural liberalism does not offer, according to Taylor. Due to the fact that Taylor considers recognition as important, this kind of liberalism that is inhospitable to difference should be rejected; rather, in Taylor’s view, a non-procedural liberalism that is involved in the cultural character of society in a way that enhances cultural diversity and is not hostile to difference is the kind of liberalism that should be endorsed. From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism is not neutral between different ways of life and it is grounded in judgments of what the good life is. According to Taylor, this liberalism takes into account differences between individuals and groups and by taking these into account it creates an environment that is not hostile to the flourishing of different cultures. Engaging in policies that promote culture is, in Taylor’s view, extremely important; cultural communities deserve protection owing to the fact that they provide members with the basis of their identities. The language of cultures provides the framework for the question of who one is. Taylor believes that identity is strongly influenced by culture; therefore, there is a moral and social framework given by the language of one’s culture that individuals need in order to make sense of their lives. Therefore, recognition and protection of individuals’ cultural communities is required for respecting and preserving one’s identity. However, in Taylor’s view, this commitment to promoting difference is acceptable only if the measures taken to promote difference are constant with what he considers to be fundamental rights. Taylor specifically mentions the rights to life, liberty, due process, free speech and free practice of religion.

From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism has implications for public policy. It means that there should be decentralized power so that communities can flourish. However, what this decentralization and non-procedural liberalism imply in practice depends on the context; in different countries with different kinds of minorities there may be different implications. Taylor mostly writes about the Canadian context and he believes that in this context the best policy is a form of federalism. In his view, Quebec should be given self-government rights so that it has power over a certain number of policies. In particular, Taylor affirms that it should have sovereign power over art, technology, economy, labor, communications, agriculture, and fisheries. In the case of language policies, Taylor contends that in some cases it is justified to violate liberal values, like freedom of expression, in order to protect the language of a community. For instance, in the case of Quebec, communications in English can be restricted by the state in order to promote the French language.  Another example is that offspring of French parents do not have the option of choosing a language of instruction that is not French. Moreover, it should have shared power with the majority in immigration, industrial policy and environmental policy. Control over defense, external affairs and currency is given to the federal government. It is important to emphasize that, in Taylor’s view, federalism is not a necessary implication of non-procedural liberalism. Federalism is not at the core of the recognition idea; rather, federalism is a kind of system that Taylor considers is the adequate option in the Canadian context, which does not mean it is a good option in all contexts.

2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism

Kymlicka believes that group rights are compatible and promote the liberal values of freedom and equality. As a result, Kymlicka offers arguments that relate freedom and equality with group rights. The argument based on freedom is strongly related to his idea of societal culture. In Kymlicka’s perspective (1995, p. 80), societal cultures promote freedom. From Kymlicka’s point of view, the reason why societal cultures are important for freedom is because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. In particular, according to Kymlicka, because societal cultures provide a framework with meaningful ways of life, then they provide the social conditions that are necessary for individuals to make autonomous choices. Autonomy, in turn, is only possible if and only if these social conditions are the ones of individuals’ societal cultures.

Taking this on board, Kymlicka’s argument is that societal cultures ought to be protected because they promote the liberal value of autonomy; they promote this value because societal cultures give, in Kymlicka’s perspective, a context of choice that is necessary for individuals to exercise their freedom. Put differently, from Kymlicka’s point of view, individuals’ own cultures provide the groundwork that individuals need in order to make free choices. Consequently, if liberals are committed to this value, they are committed to protecting the conditions (societal cultures) to achieve it. This means that if group rights are necessary for protecting this context of choice, then they are justified from a liberal point of view; for if group rights can protect the context of choice, then they are promoting autonomy. As mentioned above, from the three sources of diversity only national minorities have societal cultures. Hence, this argument only justifies group rights for national minorities in order to protect their societal cultures. In Kymlicka’s view, the context of choice is given by the access to one’s own culture, not just to any culture. So according to this view, for someone from Quebec, the societal culture of Catalonia does not provide a context of choice; likewise, for someone from an Amish community, the societal culture of Sikhs in India does not provide this Amish individual with a context of choice.

The three arguments based on equality that Kymlicka offers for defending group rights rely on a different line of reasoning. The first argument starts by observing that there is an inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state and it is impossible to be completely neutral. Kymlicka affirms that the decisions made by governments, like what public holidays to have, unavoidably promote a certain cultural identity. Consequently, those individuals who do not share the culture promoted by the state are disadvantaged. In other words, they are in an unequal position. More precisely, by observing the unequal treatment that results from the inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state, Kymlicka contends that uniform laws giving the same rights to all individuals from different cultures treat individuals unequally. To take the example of public holidays, the establishment of Christian public holidays disadvantages Muslims because their main festival, Eid-al-Fitr, occurs at a time of the year when there are no public holidays. Bearing this in mind, Kymlicka argues that if liberals are committed to equality, then they should endorse a kind of public policy that does not advantage some individuals over others; this, in turn, means that in order to equalize the status of different groups, the state ought to entitle different groups to different rights.

In Kymlicka’s view, group rights can correct these inequalities by providing the necessary and sufficient means by which individuals can pursue their culture. Although the argument for autonomy only applies to national minorities, this argument based on equality refers to national minorities and polyethnic groups. Inequalities between majorities and national minorities can take many shapes, but an example that Kymlicka likes to use is language rights inequalities. From his point of view, national linguistic minorities like those of Quebec and Catalonia would be treated unequally if they did not have the right to have their own institutions in their national language. The debate about Christian and Muslim holidays is an example of inequalities between majorities and polyethnic groups. Taking this on board, it is Kymlicka’s (1995) conviction that the two kinds of diversity can potentially be treated unequally by a set of uniform laws. As a result, any of these three kinds of diversity are entitled to group rights on grounds of promoting equality between groups within a liberal state.

Kymlicka’s second argument based on equality is that if it is the case that all individuals in society should have it, then the state is committed to promote a variety of cultures so that individuals have more options relating to choice. This argument, however, is not directed at minorities but rather at majorities, and it does not refer to a need of the minority; instead, it refers to how culture can make individuals’ lives better in general, by providing more options. Furthermore, Kymlicka (1995, p. 121) considers that because it is difficult to change one’s culture, this would not be a very attractive choice for everyone.

The third argument is that, according to Kymlicka, liberals should respect historical agreements. In Kymlicka’s view, many of the rights that minority cultures have in the early 21st century are the result of historical agreements. If the state is to treat individuals from different cultures with equal respect, then it should respect these agreements.

3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation

Shachar is another philosopher who has defended a kind of multicultural citizenship. Shachar endorses a joint governance model that she calls transformative accommodation. According to Shachar, this model relies on four assumptions. First, individuals have a multiplicity of identities. For example, Malcolm X was a Muslim, a male, an African-American, and a heterosexual. Hence, individuals have a multiplicity of affiliations that play a role in their identities. The second assumption is that both the group and the state have normative and legal reasons to shape behavior. There may be a variety of reasons for this, but at least one of them is that individuals have a strong interest both in preserving their cultures and protecting their individual rights. Third, both what the state and the group do impact on each other. For instance, the laws that the state makes about same-sex marriage has an impact on heterosexist minority groups; the heterosexism of minority groups, like the hate speech of the Westboro Baptist Church, also impacts on the state. Fourth, both the state and the group have an interest in supporting their members (Shachar, 2001a, p. 118).

On top of these four assumptions, transformative accommodation is based on three core principles; sub-matter allocation of authority, no monopoly, and the clear establishment of delineated options (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 118-119). According to the sub-matters allocation of authority principle, the holistic view that contested social arenas (family law, criminal law, employment law and so forth) are indivisible is incorrect. According to this principle, these social arenas can be divisible into sub-matters, that is, into multiple separable components that are complementary (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 51-54). In practice, this means that norms and decisions about disputed social matters can be determined separately. In other words, in each area of law, there are sub-areas and these sub-areas are partially independent; as a result, a decision made in a sub-area can be made independently of a decision made in another sub-area. In Shachar’s view, family law, for example, can be divided into demarcating and distributive sub-matters or sub-areas. In her (2001a, pp. 119-120) view, the demarcating sub-matter of family law is where group membership boundaries are defined. That is, it is in this sub-matter that the necessary and sufficient attributes (biological, ethnical, territorial, ideological and so forth) for membership are decided. The distributive sub-matter refers to the distribution of resources. For instance, it would be in the demarcating sub-matter where it would be decided who gets what after divorce.

To illustrate how this principle would work in practice, Shachar routinely uses a legal dispute that occurred with a Native-American tribe and one of their members. This is the case of Julia Martinez; Julia Martinez, was a member of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe whose daughter’s membership of the group was rejected, a rejection leading to tragic consequences. In 1941, Julia Martinez, who was a daughter of members of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe married a man from outside the group. With this man, she had a daughter, who was raised in the Pueblo reservation, subsequently participating in and learning the norms and practices of the tribe. However, according to this tribe’s law, only the offspring of male members are considered members; hence, although Julia Martinez’ daughter was raised on the reservation, she was not, in the eyes of the tribe leaders, a tribe member. When Julia Martinez’s daughter got ill, she had to go to the emergency section of the Indian Health Services. Nevertheless, she was refused emergency treatment on grounds of not being a member of the tribe; a refusal that later caused her death (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 18-20). According to the sub-matters principle, in the case of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe, it would be the legislators in the demarcation sub-matter who would determine whether Julia Martinez’s daughter was a member of the tribe or not (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 52-54). Contrastingly, it would be in the distributive sub-matter would that her entitlement or not to use the Indian Health Services would be decided.

By establishing the second principle, the no monopoly rule, Shachar defends that jurisdictional powers should be divided between the state and the group. According to this principle, neither the state nor the group should hold absolute power over the contested social arenas. More precisely, the group should hold power over one sub-matter while the state should hold power over another. Consequently, legal decisions would result from an interdependent and cooperative relationship between the group and the state (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 120-122). In the case of family law, if there is a divorce dispute, the state could take control of distribution (for example, property division after divorce) and the group, demarcation (for example, who can request divorce and why) or vice-versa.

The third principle defended by Shachar is the definition of clearly delineated options. According to this principle, individuals should have clear options between choosing to abide by the state or the group jurisdiction. In particular, this means that individuals can either decide to abide by a jurisdiction or they can refuse to abide by it and exit that jurisdiction at predefined reversal points. These predefined reversal points are an agreement made between the state and the group, where it is decided when individuals can exit the group and in what circumstances.

ii. Negative Universalism

The other approach to the philosophical discussion about justice between groups can be called negative universalism (Festenstein, 2005). Two philosophers who endorse this approach are, according to Festenstein (2005), Barry and Kukathas. Despite the fact that the philosophies of Barry and Kukathas are different, as negative universalists, they have four features in common.

Firstly, both defend the neutrality of the state among different conceptions of the good. That is, individuals should be free to pursue their own conceptions of the good. Secondly, this impartiality does not have the same impact on all citizens’ lives, that is, some will be better-off than others. Nevertheless, this is not, according to these philosophers, a counter-argument against the liberal value of neutrality, because equality of impact is not a realistic goal. Thirdly, principles of liberal theory adopt ‘basic civil and political rights’ with differentiations that may be justified through fundamental basic rights such as freedom of thought and association. However, basic civil and political rights and justified deviations differ substantially when both are permitted simultaneously. Fourth, negative universalists are skeptical concerning the normative value of culture and about providing differentiated rights to individuals (Festenstein, 2005, pp. 91-92).

1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism

Barry’s view is that liberal egalitarianism is the philosophical doctrine that offers the most coherent and just approach to protect these interests. In addition, from his viewpoint, liberal egalitarianism offers the normative groundwork for the challenges that illiberal and heterosexist cultural groups raise. His liberal egalitarian approach, in particular, has as core values neutrality, freedom and equality.

According to Barry, neutrality means that states are under the duty of not promoting or favoring some conceptions of the good over others. In general terms, this means that state policy should not promote the survival and flourishing of a conception of the good, a language, a religion and so forth. Rather, neutrality requires that states be committed to individual rights without any sort of collective goal, besides those that correspond to universal basic interests. When the state favors a specific conception of the good by assisting it, it is violating neutrality (Barry, 2001, pp. 28, 29, 122). In Barry’s version of liberal neutrality, conceptions of the good are a private extra-political matter, which refer to personal affairs (Barry, 1995, p. 118). Hence, non-secular states, like Iran or Saudi Arabia, violate neutrality in Barry’s sense because they promote a specific religion.

The other important value for Barry, freedom, means not having paternalistic restrictions on pursuing one’s own conception of the good. This implies that individuals should be provided with a considerable amount of independence to pursue their own conceptions of the good. According to Barry, all individuals should be given the means for this pursuit. In practice, this means that all individuals are entitled to freedoms that enable them to pursue their own conceptions of the good and lifestyles; in particular, Barry considers that freedom of association and conscience play a fundamental role in enabling individuals in this pursuit. Individuals may choose to live a lifestyle that liberals may disapprove of; however, Barry (2001, p. 161) considers that bad choices are something that individuals in a liberal society are entitled to make.

Barry’s third commitment, the one to equality, translates into two core ideas. First, treating people equally means to furnish individuals with an equal set of basic legal, political and civil rights. That is, equality requires endorsing a unitary conception of citizenship. Second, the commitment to equality entails that the state has the duty to promote equality of opportunity. For Barry, there is an equal opportunity when uniform rules generate the same set of choices to all individuals (Barry, 2005). This means that there is equality of opportunity if and only if, in a specific situation, different individuals have the capacity to make the choice that is needed to achieve their aims. For example, imagine that Sam and John want both to be medical doctors; imagine that Sam is from a working class family and John from an upper class family. Sam does not have the economic resources to study, but John has. In such a situation, assuming that the economic factor is the only relevant factor for equalizing choice, in order to achieve equality of opportunity, Sam should be given a similar amount of economic resources to John, so that he has the same capacity to make the choice of a career in medicine. Therefore, equality of opportunity requires that individuals be treated according to their needs. Barry also argues that equality of opportunity entails that the is under the duty of equalizing choice sets, not equalizing the outcomes that result from the decisions people make in those choice sets.

Taking this normative groundwork on board, Barry offers six arguments against giving rights to cultural groups. Four of these are a result of his liberal theory; the other two are independent arguments not related to his theory.

The first argument against difference-sensitive policies for cultural groups presented by Barry is that this would be a violation of neutrality. For Barry, neutrality requires that there is no or little involvement in the cultural character of society; hence, if the state privileged a group either by promoting this group’s culture or by empowering the group with different rights from other groups, then the state would be violating neutrality. Barry believes that liberals are committed to non-interference in the cultural character of society; as a result, liberalism is incompatible with difference-sensitive policies. In practice, what this implies for multicultural demands is that any kind of exemption, recognition, assistance or any other kind of group right should be denied on the grounds of neutrality. For example, in Barry’s view, if a certain state does not criminalize homosexuality and the governing body of a minority religious group asks recognition of its religious courts that convict its gay members for same-sex acts, the state should not concede this recognition because doing so would be giving a different right to a different group and, therefore, it would be a violation of neutrality.

The second argument provided by Barry against group rights is that the unequal impact of policies on cultures is not an interference with freedom to pursue one’s own conception of the good. In Barry’s view, laws have the aim of protecting some interests against others; the fact that they have a different impact on a specific culture is not a sign of unfairness; rather, it is just a side effect of having laws (Barry, 2001, p. 34).

Third, in Barry’s view, the only group rights conceded, especially those exemptions to the law, are cultural practices that overlap with universal human interests. In other words, if the group right and, in particular the exemption to the law, promotes a universal human interest, then it is acceptable (Barry, 2001, pp. 48-50). For instance, Muslim girls cannot be refused education on the grounds of a minor issue such as dress codes, because education is a universal human interest.

Fourth, Barry contends that because neither culture nor cultural demands are a universal interest per se, then the unequal treatment that is acceptable for universal interests does not apply to these (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13, 16). To recall, Barry’s conception of equality of opportunity entails that individuals can be treated unequally so that their choice sets are equalized. However, Barry affirms that these choice sets should be equalized only if these are choice sets about universal interests, which culture is not. In short, exemptions can and should be guaranteed for universal or higher-order interests but not for particular interests.

These four arguments are dependent on Barry’s liberal theory; they depend on his conception of freedom, neutrality and equality. To these arguments, he adds two ad hoc arguments. First, that difference-sensitive rights that aim to protect economic resources are temporary, while cultural rights are permanent. This means that those who need economic resources to equalize their choice sets only need this aid temporarily (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13). Contrastingly, according to Barry, group rights to protect culture are required permanently. Like the case of the Sikh, a permanent law that exempted Sikhs from wearing helmets would be necessary. The other ad hoc argument is that when there is a reasonable argument it should be applied without exception. If there is a case for exception, then the rule should be abandoned. According to him, it is philosophically incoherent to provide a universal justification for a rule and then relativize the reason just given (Barry, 2001, pp. 32-50).

2. Kukathas' Libertarianism

Kukathas’ approach to multiculturalism is, broadly speaking, based on two ideas: these ideas are what he considers to be human beings’ most fundamental interest and his theory of freedom of association. Kukathas considers that human beings have only one fundamental interest: the interest in living according to their conscience. In his opinion, the reason for this is, in part, that human beings are primarily moral beings and, consequently, are disposed to direct their lives/purposes towards what they consider to be morally worthwhile. Consequently, from Kukathas’ point of view, individuals find it difficult to act against their conscience. This tendency to govern one’s own conduct primarily by conscience and the difficulty to act against one’s moral beliefs can, in Kukathas’ (2003b, p. 53) view, be observed and has empirical support. An additional reason why acting according to one’s own conscience is a fundamental interest is because, according to Kukathas, the meaning of life is given by conscience (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 55). Hence, Kukathas considers that identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is their self-interpretation, which ultimately is provided by moral evaluation. It is important to notice that this says nothing about what each person’s morality is. A human rights activist and a terrorist can be both acting according to their conscience even if they are doing opposite things. Owing to the fact that conscience is a fundamental interest, Kukathas contends that the state is under the duty to protect this interest.

The second important aspect of Kukathas’ philosophy is his defense of freedom of association. According to Kukathas, freedom of association is primarily defined as the right to exit groups, that is, freedom of association exists when individuals have the freedom to leave or dissociate from a group they are part of. In other words, essential to this version of freedom of association is the idea that individuals should not be forced to remain members of communities they do not wish to associate with. Therefore, according to this definition, freedom of association is not about the freedom of entering a specific group; rather, it is about the freedom to leave those groups that individuals want to dissociate from (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 95).

According to Kukathas, there are two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for individuals to have the freedom to exit. These conditions are that individuals are not physically barred from leaving, and that there is a place similar to a market society where they can exit. From Kukathas’ point of view, a place to go is a necessary requirement for exit because it would not be credible to think that individuals had a right to exit if all communities were organized on a basis of kinship, for the options available would be either conformity to the rules or loneliness.

According to this theory of freedom, the functions of the state are quite limited. In Kukathas’ style of freedom of association, the state is not duty bound to secure individuals’ access to healthcare, education, and so forth. These forms of welfare should be provided by associations, if those associations wish to provide them. According to Kukathas’ theory, the state should only intervene to guarantee the right to exit, preserving the ongoing order of society by guaranteeing the safety and security of its citizens and preventing civil war. In practice, this means that the state has two functions. First, the state has to guarantee that there is no violation of freedom of association, that is, that individuals within associations are not being forced to remain members by being physically barred from leaving. Second, it means that the state should regulate so that there is no aggression between associations. So, even though associations can endorse practices that are extremely aggressive towards their members, it is a requirement for Kukathas that there is mutual toleration between associations. Societies cannot commit acts of aggression towards each other and, if they do, the state can, in his view, legitimately intervene to stop this aggression.

Bearing in mind the functions of the state and the internal structure of associations, this society would be a society of societies. Each society or group would have its own legislation, that is, they would have jurisdictional independence (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 97). In Kukathas’ view, the validity of the laws of communities only have local recognition, that is, the state would not recognize same-sex marriage and so forth; rather the state would be indifferent to the way individuals associate.

From Kukathas’ point of view, this version of freedom of association is compatible with the imposition of high costs of exit/dissociation and membership due to the fact that the magnitude of costs in a choice are not related to freedom (Kukathas, 2003b, pp. 107-109). In his view, this model of freedom of association is the best way to protect individuals’ freedom of conscience because it gives few restrictions to what individuals can do and consequently allows a wide variety of practices. For instance, an ethnic community where the members, generally speaking, believe that female genital mutilation is an important practice and that it is immoral not to engage in this practice, would be, in Kukathas’ view, better off if they had the possibility to form their own association where the practice would be accepted, then if they were part of a larger community with regulations against such practice.

3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism

Taking this on board, in this first wave of writings on multiculturalism, the debate has centered on discussing the justice of difference-sensitive policies in the liberal context. On the whole, there are two difference positions taken by contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written on multiculturalism; some defend that difference-sensitive policies are justified, whereas others argue that they are a deviation from the core values of liberalism.

More recently, a second wave of writings on multiculturalism has appeared. In this, contemporary liberal political philosophers have not focused so much on debates about justice between different groups; rather, they have focused on justice within groups. Thus, the debate has changed to the analysis of the potentially perverse effects of policies to protect minority cultural groups with regard to the members of these minority cultural groups. Contemporary liberal political philosophers have now switched to discussing the practical implications that those that aimed at correcting inter-group equality could have for the members of those groups that the policies are directed to. In particular, the worry is that the policies for enabling members of minority groups to pursue their culture could favor some members of minority groups over others. That is, this new debate is about the risks that those policies for protecting cultural groups could have in undermining the status of the weaker members of these groups. The reason why philosophers worry about this is because the policies for multiculturalism may give the leaders of cultural groups’ power for making decisions and institutionalizing practices that facilitate the persecution of internal minorities. In other words, those policies may give group leaders all kinds of power that reinforce or facilitate cruelty and discrimination within the group (Phillips, 2007a, pp. 13-14; Reich, 2005, pp. 209-210; Shachar, 2001a, pp. 3, 4, 15-16).

Three kinds of internal minorities have received special attention from contemporary political philosophers: these are bisexuals, gays and lesbians, women and children.

a. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals

Some philosophers are concerned about how policies meant to protect minority cultural groups can potentially impose serious threats and harm the interests and rights of lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals. In some minority cultural groups, lesbian gay and bisexuals within minorities are very disadvantaged by the unintended consequences of multicultural politics (Levy, 2005; Swaine, 2005, pp. 44-45). Heterosexism is a cross-cutting issue in minority cultural groups (and society in general), covering diverse areas of life, ranging from basic freedoms and rights, employment, education, family life, economic and welfare rights, sexual freedom, physical and psychological integrity, safety, and so forth. In general terms, it can be affirmed that lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have an interest in bodily and psychological integrity, sexual freedom, participation in cultural and political life, family life, basic civil and political rights, economic and employment equality and access to welfare provision.

Sometimes, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have their freedom of association, opinion, expression, assembly, and thought limited (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 50-55). Minority cultural groups can jeopardize these interests due to hierarchies of power within groups. Some groups use a variety of norms of social control. Also in some groups, participation in political decisions and freedom of expression is culturally determined.

In some minority cultural groups, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interest in being free from murder, torture, and other cruel, inhuman and degrading treatment is also sometimes violated (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 13-16). Many lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals are victims of physical and psychological harassment, murder, hate speech, hate crimes, brutal sexual conversion therapies, and corrective rape, among other kinds of physical and psychological violence.

Some minority cultural groups also sometimes undermine lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interests in economic and welfare rights. In the case of employment, this refers to anti-discrimination law in the workplace and in admission for jobs. In some cases, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ freedom and the right to join the armed forces, to work with children, to employment benefits and health insurance for same-sex families are denied. Although not many religious groups have armed forces, this example could apply to the Swiss Army that protects the Vatican.

Bearing this in mind, some contemporary political philosophers have discussed to what extent giving special rights to groups can potentially facilitate the imposition of such unequal and cruel practices.

b. Women

Some philosophers, especially liberal feminist philosophers, have raised concerns about the implications of providing special rights to groups for women. Okin has contended that most cultures in the world are patriarchal and gendered and, consequently, providing rights to groups may help with reinforcing oppressive gendered and patriarchal practices. Some of the practices that may jeopardize women’s rights are female genital mutilation, polygamy, the use of headscarves, and a lesser valuation of the career and education of women.

Female genital mutilation, a practice that some communities engage in, is considered by some feminists to be a cruel practice that undermines the sexual health of women and aims at controlling their bodies. Polygamy is a practice that some communities follow, with some feminists contending that this practice is deeply disrespectful to women, and a clear way of treating women unequally. The use of headscarves is considered by some feminists to be a way of controlling women’s bodies and showing submission to males. Taking this on board, the concern expressed by some feminists is that empowering groups with special rights may reinforce female oppression. For example, if some communities are exempt from the health practices of the majority of society, this may help them to perpetuate and spread the practice of female genital mutilation.

Nevertheless, it is important to emphasize that the view that cultures are necessarily patriarchal, gendered and oppressive for women is not a unanimous position among feminists. Indeed, Volpp (2001) and Phillips (2007a), for instance, have defended the position that many feminists take an ethnocentric point of view when analyzing minority practices and misunderstand the true meaning of practices. Furthermore, Volpp and Phillips contend that many women in minority cultures are agents capable of making their own choices; therefore some of those practices that can be considered oppressive from a Western point of view should not be banned.

c. Children

The implications of special rights to children who are members of minority cultures is also a topic that has received some attention from contemporary political philosophers (Reich, 2005). The concerns with respect to children are especially with regards to physical and psychological abuse and lack of education. With respect to physical and psychological abuse, some groups may have practices that are harmful for children. For example, some groups practice shunning, a practice that consists of ostracizing those who do not follow their norms or who have done something that is disapproved of by the community. The traditional scarification of children that some African communities practice is also a practice that may be considered to entail physical abuse. With respect to education, there are groups who wish to take their children out of school at an earlier age. Some may argue that removing children from school earlier than their peers may strongly disadvantage these children because they will potentially not acquire the minimum skills necessary to find a job, and will not receive enough education to make autonomous choices. Other groups consider that education should be mainly about the study of the religious scripture, and they sometimes disregard other kinds of education.

Owing to the fact that schools are a central vehicle of autonomy and cultural transmission and because children are at a formative age and, thereby, much more likely to be influenced by the way they are brought up, some political philosophers have shown concern about the impact of giving special rights to groups that may treat children inappropriately, indoctrinate them, and maybe disadvantage them when compared with children who are not members of those groups.

It is important to emphasize, however, that this is not to say that providing special rights to minority groups entails that children, women and gays, lesbians and bisexuals will be disadvantaged. Many postcolonial philosophers, like Mookherjee (2005), have contended that even though there may be worries about internal oppression, sometimes these worries are misplaced. Routinely, members of minority cultures see value in their cultural practices and wish to endorse them, despite the fact that these practices may look oppressive for outsiders. Furthermore, sometimes practices may seem illiberal to an outsider, but because their social meaning differs from the one given by the outsider, the practice is not illiberal (Horton, 2003).

4. Animals and Multiculturalism

Another topic that has not been explored very much is how multicultural policies can have perverse effects on non-human sentient animals. If a thin conception of non-human sentient animals’ interests is endorsed, it can be understood how animals’ interests may be violated by multicultural policies. Assume that animals have three kinds of interests. First, they have the interest in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them (Casal, 2003; Cochrane, 2007). Second, non-human sentient animals have an interest in some degree of negative freedom: they have an interest in not being physically restricted in cages or forced to undertake hard labor. Third, non-human sentient animals have an interest in having access to resources for their well-being; in particular, non-human sentient animals have an interest in receiving veterinary care and in not being malnourished or denied food. With this modest assumption that animals have an interest in not being treated with cruelty and instead wish to pursue a healthy life, some philosophers have contended that animals’ interests are at risk when giving special rights to groups. There are cultural groups which have practices that interfere with the interests of non-human sentient animals and in terms of multiculturalism these policies may give cultural groups powers that may facilitate animal cruelty. Some cultural groups engage in particular animal slaughtering practices because their religion imposes that meat is cut in a specific way before it is eaten. An example of how multicultural policies can be damaging for non-human sentient animals is if the exemption of minority groups from state laws on animal cruelty could lead to the facilitation of inflicting these harmful practices on animals. In particular, if those groups who practice certain types of animal slaughtering are exempt from animal cruelty laws, then this may facilitate the violation of animals’ interests in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them.

This topic raises also a problem of legitimacy. Most majority societies fail to treat animals with respect and do not usually protect the interests of non-human sentient animals. As a result, a philosophical question that may arise is whether intervention in the practices of minorities mistreat non-human sentient animals would be legitimate, given the fact that majorities themselves fail to treat animals with respect.

5. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Luís Cordeiro Rodrigues
University of York
United Kingdom

Mulla Sadra (c. 1572—1640)

Mulla Sadra made major contributions to Islamic metaphysics and to Shi'i theology during the Safavid period (1501-1736) in Persia. He started his career in the context of a rising culture that combined elements from the Persian past with the newly institutionalized Shi'ism and Sufi teachings. Mulla Sadra was heir to a long tradition of Islamic philosophy that from the beginning had accommodated the speculations of Greek philosophers, especially Neoplatonic philosophers, for the purpose of understanding the world, particularly in relation to the creator and the Islamic faith. Islamic philosophy originated in the rational endeavours to reconcile reason and revelation though the results did not always satisfy theologians, but ironically widened the gaps between reason and revelation.

Mulla Sadra, too, was deeply concerned about both reason and revelation, and he tried a new way of reconciliation by openly employing a synthetic methodology in which mysticism played an important part. For him and his followers, human knowledge is tenable only as long as it goes back to the indirect grasp of reality which in itself is not subject to conceptualization.  Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra was dedicated to the traditional forms of logical arguments that are based on premises evident to the mind rather than on beliefs which come from religious faith and tradition. For example, his use of Qur'anic verses and religious ideas, though it is an important part of his system, is mainly confined to a secondary or supportive position. As for mysticism, the extensive use of mystical concepts and terminology is acceptable from the point of view of those thinkers who believe that mystical inspiration, intellectual intuition, and revelation, originate in one and the same source, hence their celebration of Mulla Sadra's work as "prophetic philosophy." As a result, the scope of Mulla Sadra's work is wider than his predecessors. In addition to metaphysics, he wrote extensively on the Qur'an and the Tradition and no other major philosopher before him had been so productive in the field of religion.

While focusing on Mulla Sadra's metaphysics including his ontology, epistemology, psychology, this article also brings to light the philosopher's solutions to theological problems. Owing to these solutions, not only did Islamic philosophy manage to survive against religious and political odds, but also Shi'i theology never lost its foothold on the intellectual ground. Although the organic unity of Mulla Sadra's system rests on all the various components of his thought, his independent works on exegesis, mystical treatises, and his commentaries on preceding philosophers, are outside the scope of this article.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Synthetic methodology
  3. Ontology
    1. Primacy of Being
    2. Gradation of Being
    3. The Absolute and the Relational
  4. Epistemology
    1. Mental Being
    2. Unity of the Knower and the Known
  5. Soteriological Psychology
    1. Substantial Motion and the Soul
    2. The End of the Human Soul
  6. Major Theological Issues
    1. The Essence and the Attributes
    2. Temporal Origin of the World
    3. Bodily Resurrection
    4. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood
  7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition
  8. Legacy
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Philosophical Works
    2. English Translation of Primary Literature
    3. Secondary Books in European Languages

1. Biography

Muhammad ibn Ibrahim ibn Yahya al-Qawami al-Shirazi, commonly known as Mulla Sadra, was born and grew up during the golden days of the Safavid period, Iran’s first Shi'ite dynasty (c. 1501-1736). As the only son of a noble family, he received both intellectual and financial support towards a good education that started in his home town, Shiraz, in southeastern Iran. Though Shiraz had a glorious past with regard to philosophy, in Mulla Sadra's day it was not the best place for satisfying his intellectual desire.  In his quest for advanced religious and philosophical training he left Shiraz for Qazvin and then moved to Isfahan where he studied with the most eminent intellectual figures of the day, Mir Damad (d. 1631) and Shaykh Baha'̓i (d. 1576) who were also affiliated with the court of the Safavid King, Shah Abbas I (c. 1587-1629). While Mulla Sadra's philosophical character evolved in conversation and debates with Mir Damad, he owed to Shayk Baha'i his broad knowledge of exegesis (tafsir), tradition (hadith), mysticism (irfan) and jurisprudence (fiqh).  There is yet no historical evidence that he ever studied with Mir Findiriski (d. 1640/1), the other leading intellectual of the time. However, the frequency of associating the two by scholars such as Henry Corbin (d. 1978) suggests an inclination on their part towards providing a perfect picture of the philosopher's integration in the intellectual life of Isfahan with all the pivotal thinkers involved in shaping what has been called "the full flowering of prophetic philosophy" in Mulla Sadra's hands (Nasr 2006).

In 1601, upon the death of his father, Mulla Sadra returned to Shiraz. Later he related his experience during the time spent in Shiraz in a doleful and critical voice denouncing the intellectual atmosphere of the city for being hostile, suppressive, and philistine with regard to philosophy (al-Asfar I 7). He decided to leave Shiraz for a life of solitude and contemplation in Kahak, a quiet village near the city of Qom. The peace and quiet of life in Kahak gave Mulla Sadra the opportunity to start the composition of his most foundational work, al-Hikmat al-muta 'aliya fi'l-asfar al-'aqliyya al-arba (Transcendent Wisdom in the Four Journeys of the Intellect). There he also found some of his life-long students who became well-known scholars of their own time.

This period was followed by several journeys between Shiraz, Isfahan, Qom, Kashan, and most importantly, seven pilgrimages to Mecca. Apparently, this itinerant stage played an important part in his intellectual and spiritual growth that is also suggested by the "journey" metaphor in the title and divisions of al-Asfar. It was also during this period that Mulla Sadra accepted the invitation to teach at Khan School, which was built in Shiraz on the order of the new governor, Allahwirdi Khan, in Mulla Sadra's honour and for the purpose of his lectures.

Mulla Sadra had a family of six children, three sons and three daughters. All his sons became scholars and his daughters were married to three of Sadra's students whom he treated as family even prior to the marriages. We know that two of these students Muhsin Fayz Kashani  (d. 1679/80 ) and Abd al-Razzaq Lahiji (d. 1661/2 ) succeeded their father-in-law as two influential figures of their time though different to him in their philosophical orientation and working under more pressure due to the growing antagonism to philosophy and mysticism under Shah Abbas II (c. 1642-1666).

The intellectual network consisting of Mulla Sadra, his teachers and students that was later dubbed "the School of Isfahan" was formed in a unique political and religious context. Philosophers such as Mir Damad and Mulla Sadra managed to get their voices heard by their contemporaries and posterities in spite of the conservative religiosity of the newly established Shi'ite rule partly owing to the religious and political state of affairs. Since the Safavids strove to establish their identity as a Persian-Shi'ite state in contrast to the Sunni caliphate of the Turks and Arabs, they were in need of philosophy as a stronghold of knowledge that could reinforce, not to say generate, power through systematic thought. At least during the formative and golden days of the Safavid period the attacks on philosophers targeted their Sufi leanings rather than their endeavours to reconcile metaphysics with Shi'ite theology.

A prolific writer, Mulla Sadra composed a large number of treatises on ontology, epistemology, cosmology, psychology, eschatology, theology, mysticism, the Quran and the Tradition. However, many of his philosophical and theological works are repetitions of or elaborations on chapters from his magnum opus al-Hikmat al-mutaliyah fi’l-asfar al-arba‘a al-‘aqliyyah, commonly referred to as al-Asfar that is printed in nine volumes. Rather than simply holding Mulla Sadra's theses, the latter work is an encyclopaedia of different schools of Islamic philosophy and theology. With the exception of Risala-yi si asl (Treatise on the Three Principles) which is in Persian, he wrote all his works in Arabic that was the lingua franca of the Muslim world at that time. He also wrote extensive commentaries on the Qur 'an and the tradition among which respectively al-Mafatihal-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible) and his voluminous commentary on the famous collection of Shi'ite tradition, Usul al-kafi by Kulayni (d.939) are the most important.

After a pious life of dedication to acquiring and expanding philosophy and Islamic sciences, Mulla Sadra died in Basra on the way to his seventh pilgrimage to Mecca. His death was once believed to have occurred in 1640 with his body being buried in Basra. However,  modern scholarship offers new evidence, though not conclusive evidence, in support of the date of 1645 and his burial being in Najaf (Rizvi 2007 30).

2. Synthetic methodology

Mulla Sadra was determined to construct a spacious house of "transcendental philosophy" that could accommodate the apparently conflicting paths in Islamic history towards the ultimate wisdom. He was also heir to a long tradition of philosophy in Persia which had adopted the methodology of Greek philosophy and interpreted it not only in accordance with the Islamic faith, but also implicitly and partly in continuation of the antique Persian traditions. Similar to his past philosophical masters Ibn Sina (d. 1037) and Suhrawardi (d. 1191), but unaware of Ibn Rushd's (d.1198) criticism of Neoplatonism in Islamic philosophy, Mulla Sadra relied on Neoplatonic precepts which had been taken for Aristotelian ideas by preceding philosophers. In particular, he followed Suhrawardi by adopting a holistic method of philosophy in which reason is accompanied by intuition, and intellection is the realization of the quintessence of the human soul, with prophecy (nubuwwa) and sainthood (wilaya) as the noblest manifestations of it.  It is based on this holistic attitude that on the one hand, Mulla Sadra synthesizes the two main schools of Islamic philosophy, namely, the Peripatetic and Illuminationist schools, and on the other hand, bridges the gaps between philosophy, theology, and mysticism. While Mulla Sadra's philosophical methodology is rational in the sense of building his arguments on premises that consist in evident propositional beliefs, he does not reduce philosophical process to mere abstract logical reasoning. The pivotal place of intuition in his philosophical methodology is especially reflected by the influence of Ibn Arabi (d. 1240) throughout his works and by the fact that he regarded Ibn Arabi's writings as having a philosophical character with a "demonstrative force" (al-Asfar I 315). Whether we understand Mulla Sadra's use of intuition as "a higher form of reason" in the Platonic sense (Rahman 1975, 6), or as a prophetic experience that turns philosophy into "theosophy" (Nasr 1997, 57), in reality there is no actual separation between reason and intuition in Mulla Sadra's philosophy. Rather than considering ratiocination (that is, the process of exact thinking) and intuition as independent ways leading to different visions of the truth, for him they merge into one path complementing and completing each other.

Although no Islamic philosopher had ever announced reason and revelation, philosophy and prophecy in conflict with each other, in practice, several philosophical doctrines were regarded by theologians as blasphemous due to contradiction with the theological formulations of Quranic teachings. By synthesizing the findings of his predecessors and relying on his holistic methodology, Mulla Sadra addressed several controversial issues that had opened a wide gap between philosophy and theology, reason and faith. His conciliatory attitude is manifest in his writings that are replete with scriptural and theological references alongside and in harmony with the teachings of Ibn Sina, Suhrawardi, Ibn Arabi, and other Muslim thinkers.

3. Ontology

a. Primacy of Being

Although Aristotle identifies the external existence of a thing with its primary substance, he distinguishes between two questions we can ask with respect to everything: "What it is" and "whether it is (or exists)". This conceptual distinction was later extended to the extra-mental realm of contingent beings by Islamic philosophers, most insistently Ibn Sina, and following him scholastic philosophers such as Aquinas (d. 1274). For Ibn Sina, essence, or quiddity (mahiyya), is universal in the mind while particular in the external world once being is bestowed on it by the Necessary Being who is identified with the God of Abrahamic faith. Except for God who exists in His own right, every other being is composed of essence and being, hence contingent in the sense of dependence on the Necessary Being for their existence.

The distinction was taken for granted after Ibn Sina but turned into a controversial issue when philosophers in the Illuminationist school questioned the external reality of being over and above essence. Suhrawardi and following him Mir Damad argued that being was only a mental construct and the distinction between essence and being was only possible in the conceptual domain. Since then, Islamic philosophers have roughly been categorized as adherents of either the primacy of essence or the primacy of being. Influenced by his philosophy master, Mulla Sadra started as an advocate of essentialism but soon diverged towards the opposite doctrine that he made famous as "the primacy of being" (asalat-i wujud). He built on this foundation the whole of his philosophical system.

Starting with the concept of being, Mulla Sadra attributes two major characteristics to it. Firstly, being is beyond logical analysis, hence indefinable, due to its simplicity and supra-categorical status. It is self-evident and prior to any other concept in the mind. Secondly, it is a univocal concept in the sense that it has one and the same meaning in all its applications, whether we apply it to God or to any other entity. The first characteristic seems to place being as such totally outside the grasp of discursive thought. The second one leaves the philosopher with the hope that in case he finds an alternative path towards being, he will be able to bridge the ontological gap made by certain theologians between the Creator and the created.

As for the reality of being in the external world, Mulla Sadra not only follows Ibn Sina in considering being as a reality, but adheres to his other master, Ibn'Arabi in considering being as the only reality, the doctrine which is commonly referred to as "the unity of being" (wahdat al-wujud). Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra's ontological monism does not imply that essences are illusions, as it is held in radical forms of Sufism. For Mulla Sadra, though essences are not genuine in their existence, they still exist as delimitations of the Real Being that is the ground of all that exists. Using a poetic analogy, the indefinite Reality is a colorless light while essences are the colourful glasses through which the single light appears as diverse phenomena. Conceptual differentiation, without which thinking and speaking would be impossible, is owing to this semi-reality of essences. To sum up, while being is the principle of unity, essence or quiddity is the principle of difference.

Mulla Sadra has several arguments for the primacy of being and its unrivalled reality. The most comprehensive list of the arguments appears in his al-Mashair, a useful summary of his ontology, and several arguments are included in al-Asfar. For the premises of his arguments, Mulla Sadra relies on the classical understanding of essence as a universal without external effects within the mind. On this ground, the real horse can give you a ride while the universal horse in the mind is incapable of that because real particularity, external properties and real effects are owing to being and cannot be in the mind. In conclusion, being is the ground of reality, or better to say, reality itself, while essence only belongs to the conceptual realm and as Mulla Sadra put it "the term 'existent' is applied to essence only with respect to its relation to being [itself]" (al-Asfar VI 163).

b. Gradation of Being

The univocal concept of being applies to its instances in the same sense because of the unity of its reality, and conceptual differences are only due to essences. On the other hand, essences have no reality of their own. Based on these two premises, one could conclude that diversity is not real. Gradation, or modulation, of being (tashkik al-wujud) is Mulla Sadra's way to avoid this counterintuitive result and to create a system in which the monistic worldview of Sufism is reconciled with the realistic pluralism of classical philosophy and our common sense. According to this doctrine, though one simple reality, being comes in grades, in a similar way that sunlight and candlelight are the same reality of different grades. In effect, there are only differences by degrees, while essences, as concepts in the mind, reflect gradations as contrasts. As Mulla Sadra put it,

The instances of being are different in terms of intensity and weakness as such, priority and posteriority as such; nobility and baseness as such, although the universal concepts applicable to it and abstracted from it, named quiddities, are in contrast essentially, in terms of genus, species, or accidents. (al-Asfar IX 186)

Before Mulla Sadra, Suhrawardi introduced the concept of gradation into the logic of definition and considered essence as capable of applying to instances by different degrees. For example, he regarded a horse more of an animal than a fly. His ontology was based on light as the hierarchical reality of universe with realms of existence as different ranks of it. Inspired by Suhrawardi's challenge of classical philosophers such as Ibn Sina who would not allow gradation in the same essence, but in contrast to the former's belief in the ontological primacy of essence or quiddity, Mulla Sadra replaced the hierarchical light of Suhrawardi with the hierarchical being. Accordingly, Reality is one and the same thing but possessed of different degrees of intensity, which justifies diversity within unity.

The doctrine of gradation not only supports the reality of diversity, but also points out the all-encompassing simplicity of being qua being. Hence the famous dictum that is frequently repeated in Mulla Sadra's works, "the Simple Reality (basit al-haqiqa) is all things but none of those things in particular" (al-Asfar VI 111).

c. The Absolute and the Relational

Given that for Mulla Sadra reality consists in different grades of the same being, the nature of causality becomes an urgent question for him. Mulla Sadra's formulation of causality reveals the strong influence of Ibn Arabi's unity of being (wahdat al-wujud). Mulla Sadra begins with causality in the sense of existentiation (ijad) according to which contingent essences are brought into existence once their existence is necessitated by the Necessary Being. However, since in Mulla Sadra's system, essences only belong in the conceptual domain, the relationship between cause and effect cannot be explained based on the metaphysical duality of being/essence. Therefore, he finally replaces this duality by the distinction he makes between two senses of being, the independent and the relational. At the cosmic level, the only independent being is the Absolute Being, while the rest, no matter of what intensity, are only relational.

Mulla Sadra's introduction of this distinction into Islamic philosophy was inspired by the linguistic division between the meaning of "to be" in the sense of existence as a real predicate, and "to be" as a copula, the latter being nonexistent as a word in Arabic and only suggested though predication. Relational being is a "being-in-another" in the sense of being nothing other than a relation to another being. For example, in saying that "snow is white", the predicative relation that is expressed by "is" has no existence apart from "snow" and "white". Mulla Sadra regards all beings as nothing but an existential relation to the Absolute Being. For Him, "He is the Truth and the rest are His manifestations. He is the Light and the rest are the streaks of that Light…" (al-Masha’ir 450).

4. Epistemology

Mulla Sadra's epistemology is not prior to but based on his findings about the nature of reality. Though this may sound like begging the question from the perspective of modern philosophy, it is consistent with the totality of Mulla Sadra's system in which everything including knowledge itself is a form of being. It is for this reason that he studies knowledge as a subject of first philosophy, namely, the study of being qua being. He diverges from what he criticises in Ibn Sina as the negative process of abstraction (al-Asfar III 287) in favour of the positive presence of noetic or mental beings in the mind. For Mulla Sadra, knowledge is the realization of an immaterial being which corresponds to the extra-mental reality because it is the higher grade of the latter being.

Mulla Sadra's main contribution to Islamic epistemology lies in his diversion from the Aristotelian dualism of subject and object, in other words, knower and the known (̒aqil wa ma'quil). He rejected the dominant theory of knowledge as the representation of the abstracted and universal form of particular objects to the mind. This innovation, though on a different ground and based on a different foundation, is comparable to the 20th century efforts made in the area of phenomenology and existentialism to get over the epistemological scepticism resulting from Cartesian dualism.

a. Mental Being

In classical Islamic epistemology knowledge is divided into "knowledge by presence" that consists only in the immediate access of the soul to itself in the sense of self-consciousness, and "knowledge by acquisition" that originates in sense perception and provides the subject with an abstracted representation of the external objects, that is, the intelligible universal at the level of intellect. In line with the Neoplatonic trend of thought adopted by Suhrawardi, Mulla Sadra replaced representation by direct presentation (hudur). For Mulla Sadra, all knowledge is, at bottom, knowledge by presence because our knowledge of the world is a direct access to what is called mental beings.

In contrast to the Peripatetic mental form or concept as a universal produced by abstraction, mental being is an immaterial and particular mode of existence with a higher intensity than the external object corresponding to it. According to Mulla Sadra, mental being is the key to the realization of all levels of knowledge including sense perception, imagination, and intellection. Upon encounter with the external world, the soul creates mental beings in a similar manner that God creates the world of substantial forms both material and immaterial (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 43). Thus, rather than correspondence between the external object and its represented form in the mind, for Mulla Sadra the credibility of knowledge lies in the existential unity of  different grades of the same being, one created by the soul and the other existing in the external world.

Although the human soul has the potentiality of creating modes of existence also in the absence of the matter, as in the case of miracles, for the average human soul, as long as she lives in the material world, contact with matter is necessary for activating the creative process of generating mental beings. In this respect, Mulla Sadra's epistemology should not be conflated with subjective idealism in that for him the physical being is a reality though of a lesser intensity than its counterpart in the soul.

b. Unity of the Knower and the Known

Mulla Sadra revolutionized epistemology with regard to the relationship between the knowing subject and her object based on the doctrine of the unity of the knower and the known previously held by the Neoplatonic Porphyry (d. 305) but strongly rejected by Ibn Sina.  Siding with the former, Mulla Sadra redefines the status of knowledge. Previously, mental form was defined as a psychic quality that occurs to the immaterial substance of the soul as a mere accident (̒arad), incapable of making any changes to the soul's essence. Conversely, for Mulla Sadra, knowledge that is made up of mental beings functions as a substantial form that actualizes the potential faculties of the soul. Similar to form and matter in the physical world, there is no real separation between the knower (soul or mind) and the immediately known object of it, that is, the mental being. To put it in a nutshell, knowledge is a single reality that, in its potentiality, is called "the knower" ('lim) or "the intellect" ('aqil) while in its actuality, it is "the known" (ma'lum) or the "intelligible" (ma'quil). Owing to this unity, rather than being a fixed substratum for accidental mental forms, the mind in its reality is identical to the sum of all the mental beings that are realized in it. In other words, there is no such thing as an actual mind in the absence of knowledge.

This existential unification holds at all the levels of knowledge that is confined by Mulla Sadra to sense perception, imagination, and intellection. The faculty of sense perception is a potentiality of the soul that is unified with the perceptible forms (or beings) in the occasion of contact with the sensible world. Once sensible forms (beings) are realized, a higher grade of mental beings called "the imaginal beings" are actualized in unity with the imaginative faculty of the soul. The same unification holds at the level of intellection between the intelligible forms (beings) as the actual and the intellect as potential. From this level, the human soul is capable of acquiring higher degrees of knowledge that prepares her for the final unification with the Active Intellect that is the reservoir of all knowledge, and as a result, the activator of the human mind during the creative process of knowledge formation. This epistemic elevation is at the same time the journey of the soul towards higher grades of being and spiritualization.

5. Soteriological Psychology

In the pre-modern context, one should understand the term "psychology" in the sense of inquiry into the nature and mechanism of the metaphysical soul in its relation to the body. Moreover, informed by the Islamic doctrines and inspired by mysticism, Islamic philosophers regarded the human soul as capable of elevation through acquiring knowledge and spiritual practice. Mulla Sadra's psychology is not an exception to this tradition; however, in his system, the human soul is given a more dominant role within the cosmic drama that unfolds along a salvific process of perfection.

a. Substantial Motion and the Soul

Mulla Sadra describes the soul as one simple but graded reality that in its unity includes diverse mental faculties. He also regards the soul as bodily in its origin, but spiritual in subsistence. This picture of the soul's substance is unprecedented in the philosophy before Mulla Sadra. It is built on the doctrine of substantial motion that is one of the hallmarks of transcendental philosophy. According to this doctrine, all nature, including substances and accidents, is in motion. As bodily in its origin, the soul too moves from one form to another as long as it is living in this world. The substance of the soul is an existentially graded reality in which the changes take place through the superimposition of one form over the previous one rather than one replacing the other. Therefore, the unity of the soul is maintained despite the changes and her identity is preserved.

Though starting from the Aristotelian view of the soul as the form of the body, in his psychology, Mulla Sadra departs from the former in attributing to the human soul the power of growing out of the bodily attachment. Along with the expansion of knowledge and spiritual evolvement, the soul moves up to higher grades of being. The rational human soul is actualized when we reach maturity (around the age of forty), but this is not the end. At this stage, we are actually human but potentially angels or devils. 

b. The End of the Human Soul

For Mulla Sadra, the ultimate happiness of the human souls is to join in the beatific life of the Intellects. This is in agreement not only with Aristotle's definition of happiness, but also with a Neoplatonic doctrine according to which the individual souls are only particular determinations of the universal soul that descends to the imperfect level of nature by joining the bodies. Therefore, the individual human soul, though starting as a bodily being in the world, is still invested with an otherworldly spirituality due to the noble state of the universal soul before the descent. The inherent inclination toward reunion with the Active Intellect, that is, the realm of Divine Knowledge, puts the soul back on the "arch of ascent". However, the ascent toward reunion is not guaranteed for each and every human soul since there are many phases that each soul should pass successfully in order to substantially evolve and reach up to higher ranks of being.

Mulla Sadra's delineation of the soul's journey resonates with ideas of Islamic mysticism which in turn is indebted for its theoretical formulation to Neoplatonic ideas. The title of his magnum opus, al-Asfar, together with its main divisions is a proof to the mystical attachment as the philosophical narrative unfolds in terms of the famous four journeys of the soul, namely, the quest in search of the ultimate Truth or God and the final reunion with Him. In al-Asfar, the first journey that is from the created to the Creator is devoted to the concept and reality of being. The second journey is from the Creator to the Creator through the Creator, and discusses essence. The third journey is from the Creator to the created with the Creator and is about God and His Attributes, and finally the journey from the created to the created with the Creator that is focused on the destiny of the humankind.

Furthermore, Mulla Sadra explains the afterlife of the human soul based on Ibn'Arabi's metaphysics of imagination that introduces the imaginal world (̒alam al-mithal) in between the Intellectual realm on top and the material world at the bottom. In line with Ibn'Arabi and Suhrawardi, while in contrast to Ibn Sina, Mulla Sadra believes in a bipartite reality of imagination according to which imaginative forms can exist both as subjective, or attached to the human mind, and as objective, or independent, comprising the detached domain of imagination, that is, the imaginal world. The creative imagination of the human soul, which is the source of prophecy and miracles in this world, is also the key to the bodily resurrection of the soul in the next world. While in this world only the prophets and saints are capable of bringing their imagination into life, in the next world where the material bodies are no more existent, every soul will be capable of creating her imaginal body.

The bodily resurrection of the soul should not be conflated with any forms of reincarnation which is strongly rejected by Mulla Sadra. He uses the analogy of "reflections in the mirror" (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya, 126) to show the necessary correlation between the otherworldly body and the spiritual grade of the individual soul. Rather than transmigrating into another body, the soul creates its very own body that becomes an objective image of her intentions and deeds in the previous life. That is the reason why the lesser souls will be resurrected as animals while the noble ones will simply join in the life of Intellect with no bodies at all. Thus, the hierarchy of resurrected souls in the next world corresponds to the hierarchy of souls in this world. There is a subtle problem here concerning the nature of imagination and the "mirror-like" nature of the soul in terms of eschatology. Mulla Sadra's use of mirror imagery with respect to other-worldly bodies is his response to Suhrawardi on the same issue and draws on the endeavours of Ibn'Arabi and his commentator Dawoud al-Qaysari (d. 1350) to solve an earlier problem in Islamic philosophy (Rustom 2007).

6. Major Theological Issues

Islamic philosophy is rooted in the early endeavours of Mu'tazilite theologians who borrowed the instrument of Greek logic and terminology in order to formulate the doctrines of faith in a manner palatable for human reason. Of primary importance was proof to the existence and oneness of God, the nature and function of His Attributes, and the nature and mechanism of prophecy. Not only have different schools of theology offered divergent solutions to theological problems, but also theology has been in conflict with philosophy over several key issues. One of the novelties of Mulla Sadra's work was the systematic effort to resolve long-held conflicts between philosophers and theologians. Moreover, unlike his philosophical predecessors, he did not leave any religious doctrine to mere faith and believed in the possibility of rational explanation for all. His proof for the doctrine of bodily resurrection is a good example of this positive attitude. On the whole, Mulla Sadra does not see a chasm between philosophy and theology; rather, his theology is both the continuation and the ultimate result of his philosophical doctrines.

Mulla Sadra dismissed all the previous proofs to the existence of God as resting on wrong assumptions, or at best insufficient. He even criticised Ibn Sina's "proof of the righteous" (al-Asfar VI 13) because of its reliance on the concept rather than the reality of being. However, Mulla Sadra's proof, which he calls by the same name, shares the a priori character of Ibn Sina's proof. An a priori proof (burhan-i limmi) does not infer the existence of the Creator (cause) from the existence of any particular created thing (effect). For Mulla Sadra, the "proof of the righteous" is called by this name because it has the privilege of arguing for the existence of God through God Himself. Based on Mulla Sadra's ontology, the reality of being is necessary, and it is of different grades. The delimited and imperfect grades do not exist in their own right, but only as relations to the most perfect or Absolute Being. Therefore, the Absolute Being or God must necessarily exist. Starting from the reality of being, this argument infers the existence of God from God Himself because "the real being and the Necessary Being apply to the same thing", that is, God (al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma'ad 30).

As for the oneness of God (tawhid), that is, the first article of faith in Islam, Mulla Sadra further relies on his ontological views to argue against both the intrinsic and extrinsic plurality with respect to God. His argument is based on the transcendental inclusiveness of the Absolute Being. God as the Absolute Being is a simple reality in the sense of being without parts while including all things. As the most intense and the only independent being, God is inclusive of every form of existence while excluding only the imperfections and contingencies. Therefore, to assume another being next to God would be logically absurd. In Mulla Sadra, the theological doctrine of Divine Oneness can be identified with the mystical-philosophical doctrine of the oneness of being that is the only way in which the oneness of God can be understood without wrongly imagining it as a numerical concept.

a. The Essence and the Attributes

The simplicity of the Absolute Being in the sense of being comprehensive of all is also the key to explaining God's Attributes in relation to each other and to the Essence (dhat). Though the Attributes must be infinite in number and scope, human beings only know of a limited number of them through the Qur'an. The nature of Divine Attributes has been a subject of controversies between different theological schools. They differ over the objectivity of the Attributes in the sense of independence from God's Essence. In al-Asfar and al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma 'ad, Mulla Sadra has elaborated on several Attributes including Life, Knowledge, Will, Speech, Vision and Hearing. He tries to prove the reality of the Attributes in a way that would not defy the unity of God's Essence. He resolves this theological paradox of diversity in unity with regard to God's Essence by resorting to the simple reality of God's Being. In a similar way to the unity of the soul with the diverse psychic properties like knowledge and will, all the Attributes of God are not only unified with the Essence, but unified with each other. The corollary to this conclusion is that, in its ontological unity with the infinite and necessary Reality of God, each Attribute must be infinite and necessary. For example, God has necessary and infinite knowledge of all. According to Mulla Sadra, God knows the world through the knowledge of Himself and as his Essence includes all, he has knowledge of all without any limits. Nevertheless, the objects of divine knowledge exist at the level of Essence in a state of existential togetherness (wujud al-jam'i) with a higher grade of being than their existence as distinct essences in the created world. This is the way Mulla Sadra tried to resolve a long-held conflict between philosophy and theology regarding God's detailed knowledge of the world. In a similar fashion, Mulla Sadra redefines other Attributes of God in the context of transcendental philosophy with the hope of reconciling philosophy with theology.

b. Temporal Origin of the World

One of the earliest and harshest theological indictments of Islamic philosophy was carried out by the Ash'arite theologian, Abu Hamid Muhammad ibn Muhammad al-Ghazzali, (d. 1111) in his al-Tahafat al-falasifa (The Inconsistency of Philosophers). One of the most important faults he finds in philosophers such as Ibn Sina is the doctrine of the eternity of creation. According to this doctrine that was accepted by all Peripatetic philosophers the universe was created in eternity, which means that creation had no beginning in time. This doctrine has been criticised by theologians due to its conflict with the scriptural picture of creation, both in the Bible and the Qur'an.

Mulla Sadra takes a middle path between reason and revelation by resorting to his doctrine of substantial motion. According to Mulla Sadra, every particle of nature is in constant motion along their timeline which he regards as the fourth dimension of the bodily substance. Motion is not an accidental property given to nature over and above its substance; rather, it is essential to it and caused at the same 'time' with the creation of the bodily substance. Motion is by definition temporal, and substantial motion is the renewal of every particle of nature in time. Thus, Mulla Sadra concludes that every particle of nature is being recreated at every moment, which is the meaning of temporal origination. The world as a whole is nothing more than its parts, so the origination of the whole world in time is an absurd question.

c. Bodily Resurrection

Bodily resurrection is an article of Islamic faith that is regarded by theologians as a requisite for the fulfilment of the scriptural promises and threats regarding reward and punishment in the next world. As a theological issue, bodily resurrection has caused serious conflicts between philosophy and theology particularly following Ghazzali's criticism of Ibn Sina on this issue. According to Ibn Sina, bodily resurrection is a matter of faith that Muslims must believe in, but from a logical point of view, it is impossible.

Mulla Sadra follows Ghazzali in holding that scepticism over bodily resurrection is not acceptable from either the religious or logical point of view (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya 125). However, he reinterprets bodily resurrection in terms of the imaginative creation of the otherworldly body by the soul. Though immaterial, the imaginal body is possessed of the three dimensions of the physical body that make it subject to a variety of feelings similar to our dream-world experiences. This will especially serve the purpose of punishment for the imperfect souls who spoiled the prospect of an intellectual/heavenly life through their carnal obsessions in the previous world. Some souls may be pardoned after serving their time in Hell by God's Grace and the intermission of angels and nobler souls. As for the others, they will stay in Hell with their imaginal bodies forever. Despite his efforts, Mulla Sadra's picture of resurrection is not in complete conformity with that of theology. Especially, his intellectual Paradise is not different to that of the classical philosophers. Great souls are not satisfied with carnal pleasures even in this world, so their reward in the next world cannot be a carnal one.

d. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood

Influenced by Ibn 'Arabi's doctrine of "the Perfect Human" and its incorporation into Shi'i imamate by Sayyid Haydar Amuli  (d. 1385), Mulla Sadra explains prophethood, imamate, and sainthood as related aspects of the same reality. Prophets, Imams, and Saints are instances of the category of the Perfect Human (al-insan al-kamil) whose soul is inclusive of the three levels of creation, that is, the intellectual, the imaginal, and the sensory worlds. Mulla Sadra, regards prophethood as "exoteric guidance" (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 492) which is necessary for the average people. Intellectual truths that are revealed to prophets through the unification of their intellect with the Angel of revelation, identical to the Active Intellect of philosophy, descend to the level of imagination and sense perception in order to be communicated to the people.

The esoteric side of prophecy is not only the innermost spiritual meaning of it, but also the purpose of creation. Although Muslims believe that Muhammad was the last prophet of God, according to Mulla Sadra, after the death of Muhammad, revelation continued in the form of inspiration that endows the Imam and Saint with the same infallibility as the Prophet.  Thus, the content of the divine communication is the same in all three, but the form is slightly different. Prophets have a clearer vision of the Angel of revelation in comparison to the Imams and Saints (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 480).

7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition

In many cases philosophers have resorted to the Qur’an in order to reinforce their philosophical arguments. On the other hand, there is a long tradition of Qur'anic exegesis ranging from technical linguistic analysis to rational and esoteric hermeneutics (ta'wῑl) that comprises a sophisticated and independent discipline. Mulla Sadra is a special case as a philosopher who has dedicated independent treatises to Qur'anic commentaries. Moreover, there is a mutual reinforcement between his philosophy and his reading of the Qur'an in the sense that not only his approach to the Qur'an is philosophical, but also his philosophy has a Qur’anic base (Rustom 2012). Mulla Sadra does not see any conflicts between the teachings of the Qur'an and his philosophical system. Apart from several commentaries on chapters and verses from the Qur'an, Mulla Sadra also wrote about the theoretical and practical criteria of exegesis. His major theoretical work is Mafatih al-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible).

As for Mulla Sadra's work on the tradition (hadith), his monumental commentary on al-Usul al-kafi by Kulayni  is the most important. Kulayni's work is the first Shi‘i collection of Hadith and focuses on theology and jurisprudence. It has served as a textbook at the religious seminaries around the Shi'i world for centuries, and Mulla Sadra's commentary on this work has secured him a good place among the experts in Hadith scholarship.

8. Legacy

Mulla Sadra's influence on his immediate students, including his sons-in-law, Fayz Kashani and Lahiji, owed more to the mystical aspect of his works. As for his philosophical doctrines, he was only followed by the less famous among his students such as Husayn Tunikabuni  (d.1693). Especially, in the late Safavid period due to the intellectually suppressive atmosphere created by influential clerics, most prominently Muhammad Baqir Majlisi (d. 1198), philosophical and particularly mystical thoughts were antagonized by the ruling system and the clerics alike.

Nevertheless, the legacy of the philosopher was kept alive until, in the Qajar period (c. 1785-1925), a more welcoming attitude facilitated the revival of his works in the hands of his followers who worked as Sadrian scholars. In addition to editing and expounding the latter's works, as teachers they also initiated a chain of scholars that has continued until today. Among contemporary scholars and Sadrian philosophers, Muhammad Husayn Tabataba'i (d. 1981) is one of the most widely read. His books, which are based on Mulla Sadra's philosophy with some modifications, are still being taught as compendiums of Islamic philosophy at the departments of philosophy in Iran. Mulla Sadra studies particularly flourished after the Islamic Revolution of 1979. Since then, he has been widely taught both at the religious seminaries and universities with governmental funds supporting the foundation of institutes and international conferences. Among these, Sadra Islamic Philosophy Research Institute, established in 1994 in Tehran, and the World Congress on Mulla Sadra in 1999 are the best examples.

After Mulla Sadra’s death, India was the first place outside Iran to show his influence. A remarkable number of expositions and commentaries have been written on one of his marginal works called Commentary on Sharh al-Hidayah in India where it has been taught as a course book of Islamic philosophy for several centuries. Later, the Shi'i seminaries of Iraq in the city of Najaf and some influential thinkers in Pakistan also welcomed Mulla Sadra's philosophy.

Mulla Sadra was introduced into the West at the end of the nineteenth century by the German orientalist, Max Horten (d. 1945) with an emphasis on the mystical aspect of the philosopher's work. Later during 1960's and 70's, the collaboration of the French scholar Henry Corbin (d. 1978) with Toshihiko Izutsu (d.1986 ) from Japan and Seyyed Hossein Nasr (b. 1933) from Iran, led to a full-fledged introduction of Mulla Sadra into Western academia as part of a wider project of reviving "perennial wisdom". Following their work, Mulla Sadra has been translated, taught, and discussed in academic journals and circles both in Europe and North America. The contemporary generation of Mulla Sadra scholars, though approaching Mulla Sadra from different points of view, are illuminating various aspects of the philosopher's work.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Philosophical Works

  • Mulla Sadra, Risala-yi si asl. Seyyed Hossein Nasr (ed.). (Tehran: Mulla Sadra Research Institute, 1381AH solar).  
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-muta'aliya fi asfar al-aqliya al-arba'a. 5. Muhammad Reza Muzaffar (ed.). 9 vols. (Beirut: Dar al-ihya ' al-turath al-Arabi, 1999).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-'Arshiyya. Ghulam Ahani (ed.). (Isfahan: Isfahan University press, 1340 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh al-Hidaya.Ahmad Shirazi (ed.). (Facsimile repr. Qom: Intishsrat-i Bidar. 1313 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mabda' wa'l-ma'ad. Ahmad Hosseini Ardakani (ed.). (Tehran: Sitad-i Inqilab-i Farhangi, Markaz-i Nashr-i Danishgahi, 1983).
  • Mulla Sadra, Tafsir al-Qur’an al-karim. M. Khajavi (ed.). 7 vols. (Qom: Intisharat-i Bidar, 1988).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya. 3. Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1387 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Shawahid al-rububiyya. Javad Mosleh (trans.). (Tehran: Soroush Press, 2006).
  • Mulla Sadra, Majmu'a-yi rasa'il-i falsafi-yi Sadr al-muta'allihin. Hamid Naji Isfahani (ed.). (Tehran: Hikmat, 1385AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Masha'ir.Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1386 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Mafatih al-ghayb. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). (Beirut: Mu 'assasat al-Tarikh al-Arabi, 2002 rpt).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh-i Usul al-Kafi. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). 4 vols. (Tehran: Pizhuhishgah-i Ulūm-i Insani va Mutala'at-i Farhangi, 2004).

b. English Translation of Primary Literature

  • Mahdi Dasht Bozorgi and Fazel Asadi Amjad, Divine Manifestations: Concerning the Secrets of the Sciences of Perfection (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • William Chittick, The Elixir of the Gnostics (Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2003).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • T. Kirmani, The Manner of the Creation of Actions (Tehran: SIPRIn, 2004).
  • J. Lameer, Conception and Belief in Sadr al-Din Shirazi (Tehran: Iranian Academy of Philosophy, 2005).
  • Parviz Morewedge, The Metaphysics of Mulla Sadra: The Book of Metaphysical Prehensions (New York: Society for the Study of Islamic Philosophy and Science, 1992).
  • James Morris, The Wisdom of the Throne (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1981).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr and Ibrahim Kalin, Metaphysical Penetrations: A Parallel English-Arabic Text by Mulla Sadra (Provo: Brigham Young Press, 2013).
  • Latimah Peerwani, On the Hermeneutics of the Light Verse of the Qur 'an (London: ICAS Press, 2004).
  • Colin Turner, Challenging Islamic Fundamentalism: The Three Principles of Mulla Sadra (London: Routledge, 2011).

c. Secondary Books in European Languages

  • Alparslan Açikgenç, Being and Existence in Sadra and Heidegger: A Comparative Ontology (Kuala Lumpur: International Institute of Islamic Thought and Civilization, 1993).
  • Reza Akbarian, The Fundamentals of Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Reza Akbarian, Islamic Philosophy: Mulla Sadra and the Quest of “Being” (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Cécile Bonmariage, Le Réel et les réalités: Mulla Sadra Shirazi et la structure de la réalité (Paris: Vrin, 2008).
  • Maria Massi Dakake,"Hierarchies of Knowing in Mulla Sadra's Commentary on Usul al-Kafi." Journal of Islamic Philosophy 6 (2010).
  • Mahdi Dehbashi, Transubstantial Motion and the Natural World (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Max Horten, Das philosophische System von Schirázi (Strasbourg: Trübner, 1913).
  • Christian Jambet, The Act of Being: The Philosophy of Revelation in Mulla Sadra. Jeff Fort (trans.). (New York: Zone Books, 2006).
  • Christian Jambet, Mort et résurrection en islam: L’audelàselon Mulla Sadra (Paris: Albin Michel, 2008).
  • Christian Jambet, Se rendre immortel (Saint Clémentde Rivière: Fata Morgana, 2002).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal. From Essence to Being: The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra and Martin Heidegger (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal, Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006).
  • Sayeh Meisami, Mulla Sadra (Oxford: Oneworld, 2013).
  • Mahmoud Khatami, From a Sadrean POint of View: Toward an Ontetic Elimination of the Subjectivistic Self (London: London Academy of Iranian Studies, 2004).
  • Megawati Moris, Mulla Sadra’s Doctrine of the Primacy of Existence ( KualaLumpur: ISTAC, 2003).
  • Zailan Moris, Revelation, Intellectual Intuition and Reason in the Philosophy of Mulla Sadra: An Analysis of the al-Hikmahal‘Arshiyyah (London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2002).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr, Sadr al-Din Shirazi and His Transcendent Theosophy. 2nd ed. (Tehran: Institute for Humanities and Cultural Studies, 1997).
  • Fazlur Rahman, The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1975).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra Shirazi: His Life and Works and the Sources for Safavid Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra and Metaphysics: Modulation of Being (London: Routledge, 2009).
  • Mohammed Rustom, "Psychology, Eschatology, Imagination, in Mulla Sadra Shirazi's Commentary on the Hadith of Awakening," Islam & Science, vol 5 (summer 2007) No 1.
  • Mohammed Rustom, The Triumph of Mercy: Philosophy and Scripture in Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2012).
  • Mahdi Ha'iri Yazdi, The Principles of Epistemology in Islamic Philosophy: Knowledge by Presence (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992).


Author Information

Sayeh Meisami
Queen’s University School of Religion

Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang, 1877—1969)

Zhang JunmaiZhang Junmai (Chang Chun-mai, 1877-1969), also known as Carsun Chang, was an important twentieth-century Chinese thinker and a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Zhang’s participation in “The Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923, in which he defended his Neo-Confucian views against those of Chinese progressives and scientists, made a strong philosophical impression on an entire generation of Chinese intellectuals by championing the value of traditional Confucian truth claims and asserting the limits of scientific knowledge.  Subsequently, Zhang’s two-volume study of The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought (1957) and his Manifesto for the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958) cemented his identification with Confucianism, and the view of Confucianism as compatible with modernity, in the English-speaking philosophical world. Despite his association with Confucianism, Zhang was deeply influenced by the work of the French thinker Henri Bergson and exponents of German Idealism, particularly Immanuel Kant and Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel. Zhang is best known today, however, not for his original philosophical work but rather for his political activities during China’s Republican era (1912-1949), through which he and his “Third Force” party attempted to mediate between the polarized Nationalist and Communist factions in the Chinese political landscape, as well as his promotion of Neo-Confucian studies in the West. His personal motto was, “Do not forget philosophy because of politics, and do not forget politics because of philosophy.” Due perhaps to his acknowledgment of Western influences as well as his involvement in politics, Zhang remains one of the modern Confucian movement’s most understudied figures, especially in comparison to his contemporaries Feng Youlan and Mou Zongsan. Yet his dual participation in both philosophy and politics makes him an exemplary Confucian and an embodiment of the Neo-Confucian ideal of “the unity of knowledge and action” (zhixing heyi).

Table of Contents

  1. Early Life
  2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity
  5. Influence and Key Interpreters
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Studies

1. Early Life

The man known as Zhang Junmai was born Zhang Jiasen, son of a merchant family in the Jiading district of China’s Jiangsu Province, on January 18, 1887. His early education included the memorization of the Four Books and Five Classics of traditional Confucianism.  At the age of eleven, however, his forward-thinking family sent him to study Western history and science as well as the English language, although he continued to read the work of influential Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Zhu Xi. At the age of fifteen, he passed the district-level civil service examination and earned the basic shengyuan or xiucai degree, which entitled its bearers to exemption from corvée labor and corporal punishments and granted them access to local government facilities.  After continuing his studies for a few more years, Zhang taught English in Hunan Province for two years before traveling to Tōkyō, Japan in 1906 and enrolling in Waseda University’s undergraduate program in economics and political science. Like many other Chinese intellectuals of that era, he intended to take advantage of Japan’s recent and rapid modernization by studying Western thought while remaining within an East Asian cultural context.

In Japan, Zhang befriended the constitutional monarchist Liang Qichao (1873-1929), a political reformer whose activities led to his exile in 1898.  Zhang began to publish articles in Liang’s biweekly, New Citizen (Xinmin Congbao), including translations of excerpts from John Stuart Mill’s Considerations on Representative Government. Zhang’s other activities within expatriate Chinese circles included participation in the creation of the Political Information Society (Zhengwen she), which competed with Sun Yat-sen’s United League (Tongmeng hui) for the hearts and minds of reform-minded Chinese of the period. After graduating from Waseda in 1911, he returned to China and successfully passed the entrance examination for the Hanlin Academy, a prestigious Confucian college founded in the eighth century. However, the Hanlin Academy, like other official Confucian institutions, soon fell victim to the Chinese Revolution, which swept away this and other vestiges of imperial rule in favor of a more democratic and scientifically-minded “New China.” Unable to pursue his dream of becoming a government official, Zhang returned to his ancestral home, where he was appointed chairman of the local parliament. Soon afterward, Zhang’s publication of an article critical of government policy toward Mongolia led to his proscription, and he fled to Germany to avoid repression.

In Germany, as in Japan, Zhang once more pursued academic studies, registering at the University of Berlin for preparatory coursework that would lead to enrollment in the University’s doctoral program in law and political science. World events disrupted his plans yet again when the First World War broke out in 1914. Zhang turned his attention to the ongoing conflict, publishing articles in about the European political and military situations in Chinese newspapers. In 1915, Zhang traveled to England before returning to China one year later to assume the editorship of the newspaper New Current Affairs (Shishi xinbao) and teach law at Beijing University. With the conclusion of hostilities in 1919, Zhang toured Europe in the company of Liang Qichao and other Chinese intellectuals and attempted to intervene in the transfer of sovereignty over China’s Shandong Province (the home region of Confucius) from Germany to Japan by the Peace Conference of Versailles that ended the war. Having recently produced a Chinese translation of the American president Woodrow Wilson’s “Fourteen Points,” which justified the Allies’ use of force in the name of democracy and national self-determination, Zhang was devastated and rapidly lost interest in politics, turning his attention “from social sciences to philosophy,” as he later called this crucial transition in his life.

In January 1921, Zhang met with Rudolf Eucken (1846–1926) in Jena, Germany. This encounter was perhaps one of the most important turning points in Zhang’s life. After a brief interview, Zhang decided to stay in Jena to learn philosophy under Eucken’s patronage. Studying with Eucken opened Zhang’s mind to new sets of ideas, especially those of Henri Bergson (1859-1941), and questions of life, ethics and culture gained a more important place in his thought. In 1922, Zhang collaborated with Eucken in the writing of a book in German entitled Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa (The Problem of Human Life in China and Europe). The first half of the book, written by Eucken, was a short introduction to the history of European conceptions of life, while the second half, written by Zhang, dealt with the outlooks on life found in the work of major Chinese philosophers. Although Zhang’s treatment of Chinese thought was mainly historical in perspective, this text marks the first occasion on which he drew parallels between Confucian traditions and the philosophy of Kant. Here, Zhang argued that Confucius’ dictum that “what the superior man seeks is in himself, while what the petty man seeks is in others” (Analects 15:21) was comparable to Kant’s claim that the sources of morality are to be found within oneself. Thus, in Zhang’s view, both Confucianism and Kantianism see human morality as grounded in human nature and thus autonomous.

Despite Zhang’s immersion in philosophical studies, he remained active in politics. During his time in Germany, he met with many activists and leaders, including the social democrat Philip Scheidemann (1865–1939) and the architect of Germany’s post-war constitution, Hugo Preuss (1860–1925). These encounters with Weimar Republic intellectuals helped to form Zhang’s conceptions of socialism and exerted a lasting influence on his dual life in politics and philosophy. Both aspects of this dual life were expressed in his participation in “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923.

2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics

Having returned to China, in February 1923 Zhang gave a speech at Beijing’s Qinghua School (later Qinghua University) about the differences between science and what he called “outlooks on life” (rensheng guan). In this speech, Zhang claimed that the former is characterized by “objectivity,” “logic,” “analytic methods,” “causality,” and “uniform phenomena,” while the latter are “subjective,” “intuitive,” and “synthetic,” based on “free will.” Moreover, he defended the idea that, in her path to modernization, China should not only consider the sciences but also ought to define a new way, based on the “outlooks on life” of ancient Chinese sages. Zhang’s position drew considerable criticism from intellectuals associated with the anti-traditional May Fourth Movement, especially the famous geologist Ding Wenjiang (1887–1936). The difference of opinion between Zhang and Ding developed into a major political and philosophical event in the intellectual history of Republican China and became known as “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists.” This debate played an important role in the emergence of a neo-conservative trend in modern Chinese thought by raising the questions of what place science ought to have in modern Chinese society and whether scientism and positivism ought to influence modern Chinese worldviews.  The debate also played an important role in the development of Zhang’s philosophy insofar as it prompted the first publication of Zhang’s philosophical views in Chinese.

By 1923, Zhang’s conception of himself as a “realist idealist” (weishi de weixin zhuyi)—one who refused to sacrifice empirical issues for the sake of his deeply-held ideals—was fully established. Because of Zhang’s attraction to the thought of Bergson and Eucken, he was often criticized as an “anti-rationalist” (fan lixing zhuyi zhe). What his critics appear to have had in mind was not an opposition to reason on Zhang’s part, but rather his concern to avoid the over-use of the “process of abstraction” (chouxiang licheng). On Zhang’s view, when considering abstractions such as “Humanity” or “Nature,” one should always keep in mind that they are real and in front of us. Instead of building abstract systems and concepts, Zhang wanted to construct a philosophy that would embrace the reality and the fullness of the universe.

Zhang founded his “realist idealist” philosophy on the basis of a classically dualistic conception of the world. On the one hand, there is matter (wuzhi or wu); on the other hand, there is spirit (jingshen) or mind (xin). Zhang rejected monistic conceptions of the world as incoherent, going so far as to translate the English philosopher C. E. M. Joad’s Mind and Matter, which advocated the same position, in 1926. Zhang’s dichotomy between mind and matter is a structural division in his philosophy, which generates a series of opposing notions: matter is outside (wai) of the self and is fixed (ding), while mind or spirit is always inside (nei) the self and in motion (dong). The material world of nature is governed by causality, while the spiritual world of humanity is conducted by free will (ziyou yizhi). In later years, when discussing the relation between liberty (ziyou) and power (quanli) in political philosophy, Zhang categorized the former as belonging to the realm of spirit and the latter as relative to matter. His division between science and “outlooks on life” thus is an extension of these binary oppositions that are basic to his thought.

Zhang regarded science (kexue) as a plural signifier and subdivided it into two types: “material sciences” (wuzhi kexue) and “spiritual sciences” (jingshen kexue). This opposition was based on the German distinction between “natural sciences” (Naturwissenschaften or Exactewissenchaften) and “spiritual sciences” (Geistwissenchaften). While his opponents advocated science as one universal epistemology based on specific methodology, Zhang argued that one should consider sciences according to their objects, which could be any of three types: “inert” (si zhi wu), “alive” (huo zhi wu), or “alive and thinking” (youhuo yousi zhi wu). Incapable of moving by themselves, inert objects are bound to follow the rules of causality. Their movements can be explained by natural laws, and it is the purpose of material sciences to discover and analyze these laws. For instance, astronomy aims at explaining how planets gravitate around the sun. On Zhang’s account, physics and astronomy are the most archetypal material sciences.

Although plants and animals lack “mind” in Zhang’s sense, they are alive nonetheless, so for Zhang, their analysis raises further issues.  Unlike inert objects, plants and animals can move on their own, so despite the fact that causality applies to them, it doesn’t explain everything. But Zhang insisted that the presence of life in itself couldn’t be questioned by science. Following the ideas of the German vitalist Hans Driesch (1867–1941)—who was at that time visiting in China, where Zhang served as his translator—Zhang seems to believe that there is an entelechy, a driving principle that directs life and its development without being part of the soul or the organism, the existence of which precludes questioning its manifestation. To Zhang, the very foundations of life were completely impossible to analyze. Therefore, biology was not literally “the science of what is alive” but only the science that analyzes the material structure and development of living animals and plants

As for what Zhang called “spiritual sciences”—by which he meant something like social sciences—these moved beyond the realm of matter and were capable of analyzing humanity itself. Yet all the natural laws that could be found in those sciences were always linked to a material aspect of life. For instance, Zhang accepted that there were laws of development in economy; economy and society were at some point to follow specific patterns. But he insisted that these laws could only be found because there are material and fixed data to analyze. Economics, for example, deals with manufactured goods. On Zhang’s account, spiritual sciences could discover and analyze laws of nature only if their object was somehow linked to something material. Even if there are laws that condition the development of social phenomena, human beings still can use their minds and free will to modify the situation. For that reason, social laws or historical patterns can only be sought in the past.  Following Bergson, Zhang noted that the human spirit is in perpetual transformation (xin zhi wanbian): it is impossible to divide thought into fixed mental states, as our minds are always on the move (dong). Having no place to settle, no analysis can be made. Therefore, for Zhang, there cannot be any real psychology, but only physiology, a study of the relation between stimuli and the mind. According to Zhang, science cannot predict the future of humanity, which is why he rejected Marxism.

In contrast to such “sciences,” Zhang outlined his understanding of “outlooks on life” as a coherent alternative to claiming that everything could be understood and controlled by Science. In her fight for a new culture (xin wenhua), China was to cast away naturalism and positivism, and develop a new “outlook on life,” based on both Western modernity and the teachings of the ancient Chinese sages, that did not exclude or condemn metaphysics. Zhang even claimed that the introduction of Bergson’s and Eucken’s philosophies to China could give birth to “Neo-Song [Dynasty] Learning” (xin songxue 新宋學), just as the introduction of Buddhism to China had permitted the emergence of the original Neo-Confucianism of the Song dynasty (songxue).

In Eucken’s philosophy, humanity is a being at the frontier of matter and spirit, and is in a perpetual struggle to achieve a spiritual life that can overcome his material nature. By promoting metaphysics, Zhang wished to foster human spiritual life and dismiss a scientistic conception of the world that would bind human beings in the web of material causality.   Borrowing from Eucken’s Die Lebenschauungen der grossen denker (Outlooks on Life of the Great Thinkers, 1890), Zhang defined “outlook on life” as follows:

The observations, holds, hopes, and demands that I have toward the persons and the objects external to myself—that’s what I call an outlook on life. (Zhang 1981, p. 935)

Outlooks on life are not under the control of sciences. They find their source in the self (wo). Considering that “toward the world, man’s life is inner as spirit and outer as matter” (ibid.), outlooks on life are in fact what link our spiritual life with the material world. Even if people of the past can be models to follow (Zhang 1981, p. 913), everyone ought to develop his own outlook on life according to what his heart-mind (xin) tells him. That is what Zhang called the mandate of moral conscience (liangxin zhi ming). For Zhang as for other Confucians, the heart-mind is the center of the self; every moral thought and volition is generated from it. Having three principal functions, knowledge (zhi 智), emotions (qing 情) and will (zhi 志), it is what makes us human. In total opposition to the view defended by Hu Shi (1891-1962) at that time, Zhang argued that the difference between humans and animals is qualitative, not quantitative. The use of such concepts and terminology shows how deep the influence of Mencius’ and Wang Yangming’s moral thought on Zhang was. As a thinker who was steeped in Confucian tradition, Zhang considered human beings to be good by nature and wanted to promote Neo-Confucian metaphysics as a means to cultivate oneself (xiushen).

Finally, a word should be said about Zhang’s debt to Kant, which was the result of his lifelong infatuation with this eighteenth-century German thinker. Zhang’s epistemology was mainly drawn from Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason (1781); he considered Kant to be the man who “had succeeded in harmonizing British empiricism and German rationalism” (Zhang 1981, p. 949). For Zhang, knowledge is the result of an encounter between material sense information and the innate categories of the mind. Human beings have innate categories or “concepts of reason” (lixing zhi gainian) that enable them to understand, classify, and aggregate all of their sensations (ganjue). It is these concepts of reason that link sensations to meanings (yiyi). Later, Zhang suggested that knowledge, built up from the encounter of sensations and concepts of reason, is always internal to one’s mind. For instance, in 1957, he wrote that the Song dynasty Confucian thinker Ch’eng I’s statement ”Human nature is reason” [(xing ji li ye], “means nothing other than the rationalist doctrine that forms of thought exist a priori in the mind” (Chang 1957, p. 35). For Zhang, the key philosophical question was that of the relationship between a mind able of knowing (zhizhi zhi xin) and the myriad things (wanwu zhi you) or phenomenal universe, through which knowledge of all that exists, materially and spiritually, could be integrated. Assuming that the principle of mind (xin li) is universal, Zhang anticipated that the development of thought ought to be somehow similar in every culture. This argument would form the basis of his claim that a genuine Chinese modernity was possible.

3. Political Philosophy

Despite Zhang’s leap “from social sciences to philosophy,” he did not abandon political life.    On the contrary, he participated in the drafting of a new Chinese constitution and wrote

On the Meaning of Constitutions (1921).  He struggled to introduce socialism in China. Very much taken with the newly-established Weimar Republic in Germany, Zhang wished to establish a very similar political system in China. In 1923, he opened a “Political Institute” in the suburbs of Shanghai, the aim of which was to form a new political elite that would be able to shape the nation’s affairs in future years. Under its auspices, Chinese students were exposed to political philosophy, economics, sociology, and international relations as well as Zhang’s critiques of both the Chinese Communist Party and the Guomindang (Kuomintang, KMT) or Chinese Nationalist Party, which contended against each other for political and later military supremacy throughout the 1920s, ’30s, and ’40s. After the KMT occupation of Shanghai in 1927, Zhang was forced to close the Institute and ventured into underground political activities. With Li Huang (1895—1991), a leader of the Chinese Youth Party (Zhongguo qingnian dang), he illegally published a journal, The New Way (Xinlu), in which he proclaimed his political values:

 [D]emocratic government, opposition to both one-class and one-party dictatorships, freedom of speech and association, opposition to the denial of these basic human rights under the pretext of party or military rule, the opposition to party control of education, of judicial affairs, of civil servants, and the use of the army for personal or party purposes. (Chi, p. 141)

These points can be regarded as the key ideas of Zhang’s political thought at the time. In opposition to nationalist and communist conceptions of the political power in China, Zhang totally forbade the political parties to indoctrinate their members, to use military force or to practice dictatorial politics—all of which may have prevented Zhang’s own political parties from ever succeeding in the brutal political climate of China during the 1930s. Frustrated by chronic repression at the hands of the KMT, Zhang fled China once again and returned to Germany, where he obtained a position as Professor of Chinese Philosophy at the University of Jena through the assistance of Eucken’s former students. Eventually, he returned to China just before Japanese invasion of Manchuria in September 1931. In this politically-charged and highly unstable climate, Zhang assumed professorial duties in philosophy at Yanjing University in Beijing, teaching mostly about Hegel, before being ejected from his position as a result of his critical stance vis-a-vis the KMT government. Siding with the warlord Chen Jitang, the de facto ruler of Guangdong Province, Zhang again found work as a professor of philosophy, this time teaching Neo-Confucianism—first at Sun Yat-sen University and later at his own Learning Ocean Academy (Xuehai Shuyuan).

At this institution, which blended traditional Confucian education with what Zhang saw as the best of Western learning (humanities, social sciences, and physical education), he was able to put into practice what he had defended during the debate of 1923: an education that would place equal and shared emphasis on the humanities (especially metaphysics), the arts, sports, and of course the sciences. In 1939, Zhang opened another such school: the Institute of National Culture (Minzu Wenhua Xueyuan), the guiding documents of which stated:

The objectives of this academy are as follows: one, to achieve one’s personality; two, to temper and foster intelligence in order to contribute to the world scholarship; three, to deploy these activities, in which moral and knowledge are one, to participate grandly in the ordering of the world (or statecraft). (Zhang 1981, p. 1435)

To participate in the world, either as politicians or as scholars, students were first to develop their personality. For Zhang, such psychological development, along with physical ability and intellectual knowledge, were all necessary to become a full human being. Self-cultivation through education, in turn, was key to the development of Chinese democracy, which was Zhang’s primary political commitment. In his political philosophy, there is a very strong bond between the people and the idea of the State. Democracy should not be implemented from above, but rather it should arise from the heart-minds of citizens. Influenced by Confucian ethics, Zhang appears to have viewed democracy through the prism of the canonical Confucian text known as the Daxue (Great Learning), which states:

To bring the world at peace, one should first govern one’s State; to govern one’s State, one should first order one’s family; to order one’s family, one should first cultivate oneself.

Zhang believed that the Chinese people would permit the emergence of democracy as the result of their own self-cultivation. For him, the State was no longer understood as a simple technical term of political science. It was the realization of the spirit of a people, founded on the basis of law and morality. Borrowing the Hegelian idea that “State is the realization of the Spirit [or Reason]” (guojia zhe jingshen zhi shixian ye), Zhang linked the question of the State with a certain humanism and a valorization of Chinese culture. The emergence of a new political system was to be the result of a New Culture (xin wenhua), from which would emerge a new outlook on life. Unfortunately, Zhang’s academies never stayed open very long. The Ocean Learning Academy was active for only two years, while the Institute of National Culture was closed in 1942, after three years of operation.

4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity

As was the case with Zhang’s moral metaphysics and political philosophy, so also in his understanding of culture did Zhang cleave closely to his Confucian heritage. His philosophy of culture upheld a certain conservatism, according to which both Chinese cultural unity and Chinese social development could proceed organically from a shared basis in Neo-Confucian thought. In The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936), which can be regarded as a response to Liang Shuming’s Eastern and Western Cultures and Their Philosophies (1921), Zhang defended this view:

Spiritual freedom [jingshen ziyou] is the foundation of a national culture [minzu wenhua] and therefore it should be the central principle to direct the politics, the sciences and the arts of China from now on. (Zhang 2006b, p. 1)

Zhang argued that a culture is a spiritual entity that is created by, and evolved through, the free contributions of its people—not a static expression of an ahistorical will, as Liang claimed. The nation is in fact the group of persons that build a cultural unity and live together within it. The influence of the Western philosophers of history Oswald Spengler (1880-1936) and Arnold Toynbee (1889-1975) can be seen in Zhang’s view. Zhang understood European modernity to be the result of a threefold historical process, which consisted of (1) religious reform (zongjiao gaige), (2) scientific development (kexue fazhan), and (3) the emergence of democratic government (minzhu zhengzhi). The challenge for China, therefore, lay not with importing European modernity, but rather with completing its own historical process of development in evolutionary terms specific to Chinese culture.

Like many Chinese intellectuals of the early twentieth century, Zhang advocated the need for a “New Culture”; like his rival Liang, Zhang believed that Chinese culture would become the global culture of the future. However, Zhang believed that this “New Culture” would develop only in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the West, just as Neo-Confucianism had developed in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the introduction of Buddhism from India—an historical event to which Zhang repeatedly referred as a positive precedent for China’s ability to adapt to foreign systems of thought. As “the culture of harmony,” Chinese culture would find the middle way (zhezhong) between all global philosophical and cultural trends—but only if she initiated the first step in the threefold historical process by rediscovering and reviving the “Chinese national spirit” (Zhonghua minzu jingshen), which Zhang identified with Neo-Confucianism. After China revived the quintessence of her past culture—that is, Neo-Confucianism as interpreted by Zhang—she would be able to formulate a new outlook on life, which in turn would give birth to a new culture. From this new culture, a new political system and a new economic organization soon would follow.

However, unlike many Chinese intellectuals of the era who defended a racial conception of the nation, Zhang had no interest in the question of blood lineage. As he pointed out in The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936) and The Way to Establish the State (1938), one could not find any racial unity in China; since various “barbarian” invasions had produced a “blood mix” in the population, the blood of the Han ethnic majority was no longer “pure.”  Constructing a blood-based nationalism would be irrelevant and self-destructive, but constructing a culture-based nationalism was another matter:

I won’t dare say that in History there was such a thing as a pure blood Han nation, however I can attest that there is a Han Culture, which embodies the language spoken, the characters used, the calendar, the customs, the rites and so on. (Zhang 2006d, p. 9)

Zhang’s activity as a non-aligned political thinker was curtailed by the end of cooperation between the KMT and the Chinese Communist Party in 1941, and he was placed under house arrest because of his opposition to KMT policies. In 1944, he was released and traveled to the United States, where he attended the founding meeting of the United Stations. While in the United States, Zhang renewed his interest in constitutionalism and spent much of his time studying the American Constitution. After returning to China in 1946, he began to argue that a conception of human rights, or at least its seeds, could be found in the Chinese intellectual tradition, especially in the thought of Mencius. His work became the basis of the Constitution of the Republic of China adopted in 1946, which is still in effect in Taiwan today. The implementation of the Constitution failed to resolve China’s ongoing civil war, however, and with the triumph of Communist forces in 1949, Zhang fled to a life of exile in Hong Kong.

In Hong Kong, Zhang produced The Third Force in China and initiated the modern Chinese discourse on democracy’s roots in Chinese tradition. Having identified elements of democratic sensibilities in ancient Chinese texts, Zhang held out hope that the establishment of democracy in China still was possible despite the victory of Communism on the mainland.  He even suggested that the Enlightenment and the development of democratic ideas in the West during the eighteenth century were made possible due to the introduction of Confucian thought to Europe by Jesuit missionaries a century earlier. Thus, in Zhang’s view, Confucius and Mencius were the hidden sources of the West’s Enlightenment. Moreover, Zhang regarded Marxism as being in total opposition to the “Chinese outlook on life,” and anticipated the eventual decline of Communist ideology in China. In 1957 and 1962, he issued in English the two volumes of his magnum opus on the intellectual history of China, The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought, which opens with the following sentence:

China is the land of Confucianism. (Chang 1957, p.15)

In Zhang’s biographically-focused and comparatively-oriented account of Neo-Confucianism, rooted in his conception of “outlooks on life” in the East and the West, he criticized Communism as an alien system of thought that would not take root in Chinese culture, which he believed was characterized by Confucianism despite the influence of other traditions. Identifying himself as a twentieth century “Neo-Confucian,” Zhang continued to advocate what he saw as a genuine Chinese Confucian modernity until his death at age eighty-two in the United States in 1969, which also marked the height of the Communists’ “Cultural Revolution” campaign against Confucianism and other emblems of Chinese tradition.

5. Influence and Key Interpreters

Zhang’s involvement in the production of A Manifesto on the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958), a document that aimed to promote an appreciation of Chinese culture among Western intellectuals, marks him as one of the key influences on the modern “New Confucian” movement, which seeks to promote Confucianism as a spiritual tradition that is fully compatible with democracy, science, and other aspects of modernity. Zhang’s participation in this movement probably stands as his foremost legacy in the world of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Despite Zhang’s stature as a founder of New Confucianism and a promoter of Neo-Confucian studies in the West, he is little studied today, especially by Western scholars. Most Western research on Zhang’s thought has focused on his political philosophy and activism—an approach exemplified by the work of Roger B. Jeans (1997). Studies that depart from this rule include those of Umberto Bresciani (2001) and Edmund S.K. Fung (2003). German scholars have taken a particular interest in the ways in which Zhang’s work might apply to resolving modern problems, such as the deterioration of social relationships and the spiritual vacuum perceived in contemporary societies. Werner Messner (1994) has devoted attention to the tension between the process of modernization and the will to find a specific way (Sonderweg) for China in the thought of modern Chinese philosophers, especially Zhang.

Unsurprisingly, interest in Zhang’s work has been greater in the Chinese-speaking world, especially outside of mainland China. Zhang’s friends and associates produced much of the early scholarship on his thought. Xue Huayuan’s 1993 study of Zhang’s political activity ranks with Jeans’ work among the major research on Zhang produced to date. Within mainland China, for many years Zhang’s thought was proscribed because his idealist views and “bourgeois” background. Even after studies of Zhang by mainland Chinese scholars began to appear in the 1990s, many—such as those by Lü Xichen and Chen Ying (1996)—were harshly critical of his shortcomings as seen from a Marxist perspective. More recently, Zheng Dahua (1997, 1999) has produced more sympathetic scholarship on Zhang’s thought, while Chai Wenhua (2004) has explored Zhang’s conception of culture in particular. Most recently, Weng Hekai’s work (2010) focuses on Zhang’s contributions to the question of Chinese nation-building, especially the influence of John Stuart Mill to Zhang’s thinking about this issue. As interest in Zhang’s special concerns, such as Chinese cultural unity, constitutionalism, and an authentically Chinese modernity, intensifies in contemporary China, interest in Zhang’s legacy is sure to increase there and elsewhere.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

  • Chang, Carsun.  The Third Force in China, New York: Bookman Associates, 1952.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucian thought. 2 vols. New York: Bookman Associates, 1957-1962.
  • Chang, Carsun. Wang Yang-ming: Idealist Philosopher of Sixteenth-Century China. Jamaica, NY: St.  John’s University Press, 1962.
  • Chang, Carsun, and Rudolf Eucken. Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa, Leipzig: Quelle & Meyer, 1922.
  • Chang, Carsun, and Kalidas Nag.  China and Gandhian India. Calcutta: The Book Company, 1956.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Guoxian yi (1921). In Xian Zheng zhi dao (Beijing: Qianghua daxue chubanshe, 2006a).
  • Zhang, Junmai. Minzu fuxing de xueshu jichu (1935). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006b.
  • Zhang, Junmai.  Mingri zhi Zhongguo wenhua (1936). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006c.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Li guo zhi dao (1938). In Xian Zheng zhi dao (Beijing: Qianghua daxue chubanshe, 2006d).
  • Zhang, Junmai. Yili xue shi jiang gangyao (1955). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Bijiao Zhong Ri Yangming xue. Taibei: Taiwan shangwu yinshu guan, 1955.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Bianzheng weiwu zhuyi bolun. Hong Kong: Youlian chubanshe, 1958.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Zhongguo zhuanzhi junzhu zhengzhi pingyi. Taibei: Hongwen guan chubanshe, 1986.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Rujia zhexue zhi fuxing. Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006.
  • Zhang, Junmai, and Wenxi Cheng. Zhong Xi Yin zhexue wenji. 2 vols. Taibei: Taiwan xuesheng shuju, 1970.
  • Zhang, Junmai, and Huayuan Xue. Yijiusijiu nian yihou Zhang Junmai yanlun ji. Taibei : Daoxiang chubanshe, 1989.

b. Secondary Studies

  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Chai, Wenhua. Xiandai xin ruxue wenhua guan yanjiu. Beijing: Xinhua shudian, 2004.
  • Chen, Huifen. “Minzu xing, Shidai xing, Zizhu xing: 1930 niandai Zhang Junmai de wenhua jueze.” Taiwan shida lishi xuebao 28 (June 2000): 109–158.
  • Chen, Xianchu. Jingshen ziyou yu minzu fuxing – Zhang Junmai sixiang zonglun. Changsha: Hunan Jiaoyu chubanshe, 1999.
  • Chi, Wen-shun. Ideological conflicts in Modern China: Democracy and Authoritarianism.  New Brunswick: Transaction Books, 1986.
  • Fang, Shiduo, ed. Zhang Junmai zhuanji ziliao. 8 vols. Taibei: Tianyi, 1979-1981.
  • Frohlich, Thomas. Staatsdenken im China der Republikzeit (1912–1949): Die Instrumentalisierung philosophischer Ideen bei chinesischen Intellektuellen. Frankfurt: Campus Verlag, 2000.
  • Fung, Edmund S.K. “New Confucianism and Chinese Democratization: The Thought and Predicament of Zhang Junmai.” Twentieth Century China 28/2 (April 2003): 41-71.
  • He, Xinquan (Ho Hsin-Chuan). “Zhang Junmai de Xinruxue qimeng jihua : yi ge xiandai vs. Houxiandai shidu.” Taiwan dongya wenming yanjiu xuekan 8/1/15 (July 2011): 209-234.
  • Hung, Mao-hsiung. Carsun Chang (1887–1969) und seine Vorstellung vom Sozialismus in China.  Ph.D. diss.  Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität, 1980.
  • Jeans, Roger B. Syncretism in Defense of Confucianism: An Intellectual and Political Biography of Early Years of Chang Chünmai, 1887-1923. Ph.D. diss., George Washington University, 1974.
  • Jeans, Roger B. Democracy and socialism in Republican China: the politics of Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang), 1906-1941.  Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1997.
  • Jiang, Yongzhen. “Zhang Junmai.”  In Shounan Wang, ed., Zhongguo lidai sixiang jia (Taipei: Taiwan shangwu yinshu guan faxing, 1987), 10: 6230-6352.
  • Liu, Yilin, and Qingfeng Luo. Zhang Junmai pinglun. Nanchang: Bai hua zhou wenyi chubanshe, 1996.
  • Lü, Xichen, and Ying Chen. Xin ruxue: Zhang Junmai sixiang yanjiu. Tianjin: Tianjin renmin chubanshe, 1996.
  • Meissner, Werner. China zwischen nationalem “Sonderweg”, und universaler Modernisierung – Zur Rezeption westlichen Denkens in China.  Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag, 1994.
  • Peterson, Kent McLean. A Political Biography of Zhang Junmai, 1887-1949. Ph.D. diss., Princeton University, 1999.
  • Tan, Chester C.  Chinese Political Thought in the 20th Century. Melbourne: Wren Pub., 1972.
  • Weng, Hekai. Xiandai Zhongguo de Ziyou minzu zhuyi: Zhang Junmai Minzu jianguo sixiang pingzhuan. Beijing: Falü chubanshe, 2010.
  • Xu, Jilin. Wuqiong de kunhuo: Huang Yanpei, Zhang Junmai yu xiandai Zhongguo. Shanghai: Sanlian shudian, 1998.
  • Xue, Huayuan. Minzhu xianzheng yu minzu zhuyi de bianzheng fazhan: Zhang Junmai sixiang yanjiu.  Taibei: Daohe chubanshe, 1993.
  • Yang, Yongqian. Zhonghua minguo xianfa zhi fu: Zhang Junmai zhuanji. Taibei: Tangshan, 1993.
  • Ye, Qizhong (Yap Key-chong). “Cong Zhang Junmai he Ding Wenjiang liang ren he Renshengguan yi wen kan 1923 nian ‘Ke Xuan lunzhan’ de baofa yu kuozhan.”  Zhongyang yanjiu yuan jindai shi yanjiu shuo jikan 25 (June 1996): 211-267.
  • Zhang, Rulun. “Zhongguo xiandai sixiang shang de Zhang Junmai.” In Jilin Xu, ed., Ershi Shiji Zhongguo sixiang shi lun (Shanghai: Dongfang chuban zhongxin, 2000), 2:124-153.
  • Zheng, Dahua. Zhang Junmai zhuan. Beijing: Zhonghua shuju, 1997.
  • Zheng, Dahua. Zhang Junmai xueshu sixiang pingzhuan. Beijing: Beijing Tushuguan chubanshe, 1999a.
  • Zheng Dahua. Liangqi qicai – Mingren bixia de Zhang Junmai. Shanghai: Dongfang chuban zhongxin, 1999b.
  • Zheng, Jiadong. Xiandai xin rujia gailun. Nanning: Guangxi renmin chubanshe, 1990.


Author Information

Joseph Ciaudo
Institute of Eastern Languages and Civilizations

Latin American Philosophy

This article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy: the thinking of its indigenous peoples, the debates over conquest and colonization, the arguments for national independence in the eighteenth century, the challenges of nation-building and modernization in the nineteenth century, the concerns over various forms of development in the twentieth century, and the diverse interests in Latin American philosophy during the opening decades of the twenty-first century. Rather than attempt to provide an exhaustive and impossibly long list of scholars’ names and dates, this article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy while trying to provide a meaningful sense of detail by focusing briefly on individual thinkers whose work points to broader philosophical trends that are inevitably more complex and diverse than any encyclopedic treatment can hope to capture.

The term “Latin American philosophy” refers broadly to philosophy in, from, or about Latin America. However, the definitions of both “Latin America” and “philosophy” are historically fluid and contested, leading to even more disagreement when combined. “Latin America” typically refers to the geographic areas on the American continent where languages derived from Latin are widely spoken: Portuguese in Brazil, and Spanish in most of Central America, South America, and parts of the Caribbean. The French-speaking parts of the Caribbean are sometimes included as well, but all mainland North American regions north of the Rio Grande are excluded in spite of French being widely spoken in Canada. Although it is anachronistic to speak of Latin American philosophy before the 1850s when the term “Latin America” first entered usage, most scholars agree that Latin American philosophy extends at least as far back as the sixteenth century when the Spanish founded the first schools and seminaries in the “New World”. Given this widespread agreement that there was “Latin American philosophy” before anyone was using the term “Latin America,” many scholars have argued for including pre-Columbian and pre-Cabralian thought in the history of Latin American philosophy. A number of indigenous cultures (particularly the Aztecs, Mayas, Incas, and Tupi-Guarani) produced sophisticated systems of thought long before Europeans arrived with their own understanding of “philosophy.”

The scholarly debate over whether or not to include indigenous thought in the history of Latin American philosophy reveals that the question of what constitutes Latin American philosophy hinges upon both our understanding of what constitutes Latin America and our understanding of what constitutes philosophy. It is worthwhile to remember that these and other labels are the products of human activity and dispute, not the result of a pre-ordained teleological process. Just as “America” was not called “America” by its indigenous inhabitants, the term “Latin America” emerged in the nineteenth century from outside of the region in French intellectual circles. The term competed against terms like “Ibero-America” until “Latin America” gained widespread and largely unquestioned usage in public and academic discourse in the second half of the twentieth century. More than a debate over mere terms, Latin American philosophy demonstrates a longstanding preoccupation with the identity of Latin America itself and a lively debate over the authenticity of its philosophy. Given the history of colonialism in the region, much of the history of Latin American philosophy analyzes ethical and sociopolitical issues, frequently treating concrete problems of practical concern like education or political revolution.

Table of Contents

  1. Indigenous Period
  2. Colonial Period
    1. Scholasticism and Debates on Conquest
    2. Post-conquest Indigenous Thought
    3. Proto-nationalism
    4. Proto-feminism
    5. Enlightenment Philosophy
  3. Nineteenth Century
    1. Political Independence
    2. Mental and Cultural Emancipation
    3. Positivism
  4. Twentieth Century
    1. Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism
    2. Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions
    3. Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy
    4. Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy
    5. Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation
    6. Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism
  5. Twenty-First Century
    1. Plurality of Philosophies in Latin America
    2. Normalization of Latin American Philosophy in the United States
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Indigenous Period

Most histories of Western philosophy claim that philosophy began in ancient Greece with Thales of Miletus (c.624–c.546 B.C.E.) and other pre-Socratics who engaged in sophisticated speculation about the origins of the universe and its workings. There is ample evidence that a number of indigenous peoples in present-day Latin America also engaged in this sort of sophisticated speculation well before the 1500s when Europeans arrived to ask the question of whether it was philosophy. Moreover, a few Europeans during the early colonial period, including the Franciscan priest Bernardino de Sahagún (1499-1590), reported the existence of philosophy and philosophers among the indigenous Aztecs of colonial New Spain. In any case, whether or not most sixteenth-century European explorers, conquistadores, and missionaries believed that there were indigenous philosophies and philosophers, indigenous cultures produced sophisticated systems of thought centuries before Europeans arrived.

The largest and most notable of these indigenous civilizations are: the Aztec (in present-day central Mexico), the Maya (in present-day southern Mexico and northern Central America), and the Inca (in present-day western South America centered in Peru). Considerable challenges face scholars attempting to understand their complex systems of thought, since almost all of their texts and the other artifacts that would have testified most clearly concerning their intellectual production were systematically burned or otherwise destroyed by European missionaries who considered them idolatrous. Nevertheless, scholars have used the handful of pre-colonial codices and other available sources to reconstruct plausible interpretations of these philosophies, while remaining cognizant of the dangers inherent in using Western philosophical concepts to understand non-Western thought. See the article on Aztec Philosophy for an excellent example.

2. Colonial Period

Academic philosophy during the colonial period was dominated by scholasticism imported from the Iberian Peninsula. With the support of Charles V—the first king of Spain and Holy Roman Emperor from 1516 to 1556—schools, monasteries, convents, and seminaries were established across the Indies (as the American continent and Caribbean were known then). Mexico was the main philosophical center in the early colonial period, with Peru gaining importance in the seventeenth century. The adherents of various religious orders who taught at these centers of higher learning emphasized the texts of medieval scholastics like Thomas Aquinas and Duns Scotus, as well as their Iberian commentators, particularly those associated with the School of Salamanca, for example, Francisco de Vitoria (c.1483-1546), Domingo de Soto (1494-1560), and Francisco Suárez (1548-1617). The thoroughly medieval style and sources of their theological and philosophical disputations concerning the Indies and its peoples contrast starkly with the extraordinarily new epistemological, ethical, religious, legal, and political questions that arose over time alongside attempts to colonize and missionize the New World. Much of the philosophy developed in the Indies appeared in isolation from its social and political context. For example, there was nothing uniquely Mexican about Antonio Rubio’s (1548-1615) Logica mexicana (1605). This careful analysis of Aristotelian logic in light of recent scholastic developments brought fame to the University of Mexico when it was adopted as logic textbook back in Europe where it went through seven editions.

a. Scholasticism and Debates on Conquest

One of the most famous philosophical debates of the early colonial period concerned the supposed rights of the Spanish monarchy over the indigenous peoples of the Indies. Bartolomé de las Casas (1484-1566) debated Ginés de Sepúlveda (1490-1573) at the Council of Valladolid (1550-1551). Sepúlveda, who had never traveled to America, defended the Spanish conquest as an instance of just war, outlined the rights of the colonizers to seize native lands and possessions, and claimed that it was morally just to enslave the Indians, arguing on the basis of Thomism, Scripture, and Aristotelian philosophy. Las Casas countered Sepúlveda’s arguments by drawing upon the same theological and philosophical sources as well as decades of his own experiences living in different parts of the Indies. Las Casas argued that the war against the Indians was unjust, that neither Spain nor the Church had jurisdiction over Indians who had not accepted Christ, and that Aristotle’s category of “natural slaves” did not apply to the Indians. No formal winner of the debate was declared, but it did lead to las Casas’ most influential work, In Defense of the Indians, written from 1548-1550.

b. Post-conquest Indigenous Thought

Indigenous perspectives on some of these philosophical issues emerge in post-conquest texts that also depict pre-colonial life and history in light of more recent colonial violence. The work of Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616), a native Andean intellectual and artist, serves as an excellent example. Written around 1615 and addressed to King Philip III of Spain, Guamán Poma’s The First New Chronicle and Good Government consists of nearly 800 pages of text in Spanish accompanied by many Quechua phrases and nearly 400 line drawings. Guamán Poma skillfully combines local histories, Spanish chronicles of conquest, Catholic moral and philosophical discourses (including those of Bartolomé de las Casas), various eyewitness accounts (including his own), and oral reports in multiple indigenous languages, to build a powerful case for maximum Indian autonomy given the ongoing history of abuse by Spanish conquerors, priests, and government officials. This and other post-conquest native texts affirm the ongoing existence of native intellectual traditions, contest the colonial European understanding of indigenous peoples as barbarians, and challenge Eurocentric views of American geography and history.

c. Proto-nationalism

As part of European conquest and colonization a new social hierarchy or caste system based on race was developed. White Spanish colonists born on the Iberian Peninsula (peninsulares) held the highest position, followed by white Spaniards born in the Indies (criollos), both of whom were far above Indians (indios) and Africans (negros) in the hierarchy. First generation individuals born to parents of different races were called mestizos (Indian and white), mulatos (African and white), and sambos (Indian and African). The subsequent mixing of already mixed generations further complicated the hierarchy and led to a remarkably complex racial terminology. In any case, higher education was almost always restricted to whites, who typically had to demonstrate the purity of their racial origins in order to enroll. By the seventeenth century, well-educated criollos were developing new perspectives on the Indies and their colonial experience. Anxious to maintain their status through intellectual ties to the Iberian Peninsula while nevertheless establishing their own place and tradition in America, these thinkers reflected on diverse topics while developing a proto-nationalist discourse that would eventually lead to independence. The work of Carlos de Sigüenza y Góngora (1645-1700) provides an interesting case of criollo ambivalence with respect to American identity. On the one hand, Sigüenza idealized Aztec society and was one of the first criollos to appropriate their past in order to articulate the uniqueness of American identity. On the other hand, this did not prevent Sigüenza from despising contemporary Indians, especially when they rioted in the streets during a food shortage in Mexico City.

d. Proto-feminism

Similar to the way in which scholars have retrospectively perceived a budding nationalism in intellectuals like Sigüenza, Sor Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651-1695) is widely regarded as a forerunner of feminist philosophy in Latin America. Just as non-whites were typically barred from higher education based on European assumptions of racial inferiority, women were not permitted access to formal education on the assumption of sexual inferiority. Basic education was provided in female convents, but their reading and writing still occurred under the supervision of male church officials and confessors. After establishing a positive reputation for knowledge across literature, history, music, languages, and natural science, Sor Juana was publicly reprimanded for entering the male-dominated world of theological debate. Under the penname of Sor Philothea de la Cruz (Sister Godlover of the Cross), the Bishop of Puebla told Sor Juana to abandon intellectual pursuits that were improper for a woman. Sor Juana’s extensive answer to Sor Philothea subtly but masterfully defends rational equality between men and women, makes a powerful case for women’s right to education, and develops an understanding of wisdom as a form of self-realization.

e. Enlightenment Philosophy

Although leading Latin American intellectuals in the eighteenth century did not completely abandon scholasticism, they began to draw upon new sources in order to think through new social and political questions. Interest grew in early modern European philosophy and the Enlightenment, especially as this “new philosophy” entered the curriculum of schools and universities. The experimental and scientific methods gained ground over the syllogism, just as appeals to scriptural or Church authority were slowly replaced by appeals to experience and reason. The rational liberation from intellectual authority that characterized the Enlightenment also fueled desires for individual liberty and national autonomy, which became defining issues in the century that followed.

3. Nineteenth Century

a. Political Independence

In the early nineteenth century, national independence movements swept through Latin America. However, some scholars have categorized these wars for independence as civil wars, since the majority of combatants on both sides were Latin Americans. Criollos, although a numerical minority (roughly 15% of the Latin American population in the early nineteenth century), led the push for political independence and clearly gained the most from it. In contrast, most of the combatants were mestizos (roughly 25% of the population) and indios (roughly 45% of the population) whose positions in society after national independence were scarcely improved and sometimes even made worse.

Scholars disagree about whether to understand changes in Latin American thought as causes or as effects of these political independence movements. In any case, Simon Bolívar (1783-1830) is generally considered to be their most prominent leader. Not only was “The Liberator” a military man and political founder of new nations, he was also an intellectual who developed a clear and prescient understanding of the challenges that lay ahead for Latin America not just in his own time but well into the future. Bolívar gained his philosophical, historical, and geographical perspective from both book-learning and extensive travels throughout much of Europe and the United States. Frequently citing the French Enlightenment philosopher Montesquieu (1689-1755) in his political writings, Bolívar believed that good laws and institutions were not the sorts of things that should simply be copied. Rather they must be carefully adapted to particular historical, geographical, and cultural realities. In this light, Bolívar perceived that the immediate costs of Latin American independence included anarchy, chaos, and a general lack of both personal and political virtue. He thus sought to create strong but subtle forms of centralized power capable of balancing new political freedoms. At the same time he sought to establish an educational system capable of developing an autonomous, independent national consciousness from a heteronomous and dependent colonial consciousness that had never been permitted to practice the art of government. Bolívar’s passionate calls for freedom and equality for all Latin Americans, including the emancipation of slaves, were thus consistently coupled with reasons that justified the concentration of authority in a small, well-educated group of mostly criollo elite. The result was that colonial socioeconomic structures remained firmly intact even after independence, leaving a gap between the ideals of liberty and the practical reality experienced by most people.

b. Mental and Cultural Emancipation

By the middle of the nineteenth century, most Latin American countries were no longer colonies, although a few did not achieve independence until considerably later (for example, Cuba in 1898). Nevertheless, there was a widespread sense even among political and intellectual elites that complete independence had not been achieved. Many thinkers framed the problem in terms of a distinction been the political independence that had already been achieved and the mental or cultural emancipation that remained as the task for a new generation. By developing their own diagnosis of the lingering colonial mindset, this generation sought to give birth to a new American culture, literature, and philosophy. Some of the most important were: Andrés Bello (1781-1865) in Venezuela,  Francisco Bilbao (1823-1865) and José Victorino Lastarria (1817-1888) in Chile, Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810-1884) and Domingo Faustino Sarmiento (1811-1888) in Argentina, Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) in Mexico, Juan Montalvo (1833-1889) in Ecuador, Manuel González Prada (1844-1918) in Peru, and Luis Pereira Barreto (1840-1923) in Brazil. Among these thinkers, Juan Bautista Alberdi was the first to explicitly address the question of the character and future of Latin American philosophy, which he believed to be intimately linked with the character and future of the Latin American people. (It is worth reiterating the fact that the term “Latin America” still did not exist and that Alberdi spoke about the future of “American philosophy” as a reflection of the “American people” without meaning to include the philosophy or people of the United States). For Alberdi, Latin American philosophy should be used an intellectual tool for developing an understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the people of Latin America. (It is worth nothing that Alberdi’s references to “the people” of Latin America were aimed primarily at his fellow criollos, implicitly excluding the non-white majority of the population). Alberdi’s Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina served as one of the major foundations for Argentina’s 1853 Constitution, which with amendments remains in force to this day.

c. Positivism

Almost all of the thinkers from the generation that sought intellectual and cultural emancipation from the colonial past came to identify with the philosophy of positivism, which dominated much of the intellectual landscape of Latin America throughout the second half of the nineteenth century. Strictly speaking, positivism originated in Europe with the French philosopher Auguste Comte (1798-1859), but it was warmly welcomed by many Latin American intellectuals who saw Comte’s motto of “order and progress” as a European version of what they had been struggling for themselves. While adapting positivism to their own regional conditions, they presented it optimistically as a philosophy based upon an experimental and scientific method that could modernize both the economy and the educational system in order to produce social and political stability. The influence of positivism on Latin America is perhaps most vividly portrayed in Brazil’s current flag, adopted in 1889, which features the words Ordem e Progresso (Order and Progress). However, the literal adoption of Comte’s motto masks the fact that the meaning of positivism in Latin America underwent considerable change under the influence of the English philosopher Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) and others who both sought to reformulate positivism in light of Darwinian evolutionary theory. This later variety of evolutionary positivism was also frequently called materialism, characterized by its rejection of dualist and idealist metaphysics, its mechanistic philosophy of history, its promotion of intense industrial competition as the primary means of material progress, and its frequent explanation of various social and political problems in biological terms of racial characteristics. While the precise understanding of positivism differed from thinker to thinker and the scope of positivism’s influence varied from country to country, there is little question of its overall importance.

The history of positivism in Mexico can be used to illustrate the shifting meaning of positivism in a particular national context. Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) founded the National Preparatory School in Mexico City in 1868 and made a modified form of Comte’s positivism the basis of its curriculum. Barreda understood Mexico’s social disorder to be a direct reflection of intellectual disorder, which he sought to reorganize in its entirety under the authority of President Benito Juárez. Like Comte, Barreda wanted to place all education in the service of moral, social, and economic progress. Unlike Comte, Barreda interpreted political liberalism as an expression of the positive spirit, modifying Comte’s famous motto to read: “Liberty as the means; order as the base; progress as the end.” The philosophical positions held by the second generation of Mexican positivists were quite different, even though they all hailed Barreda as their teacher. Eventually, many of them joined the científicos, a circle of technocratic advisors to the dictator Porfirio Díaz. The most famous among them, Justo Sierra (1848-1912), developed his philosophy of Mexican history using Spencer’s theory of evolution in an attempt to accelerate the evolution of Mexico through a kind of social engineering. Although Sierra initially judged Porfirio Díaz’s dictatorship to be necessary in order to secure the order necessary to make progress possible, in the final years of his life Sierra cast doubt upon both positivism and the dictatorship it had been used to support.

One of the earliest critics of positivism in Latin America was the Cuban philosopher Jose Martí (1853-1895). His criticism was linked to a different vision of what he called Nuestra América (Our America”), reclaiming the word “America” from the way it is commonly used to refer exclusively to the United States of America. Whereas positivists or materialists tended to explain the evolutionary backwardness of Latin America in terms of the biological backwardness of the races that constituted the majority of its population, Martí pointed to the ongoing international history of political and economic policies that systematically disadvantaged these same people. Like Juan Bautista Alberdi had done a generation before, Martí called for Latin American intellectuals to develop their own understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the Latin American people. Unlike Alberdi, Martí took a more positive and inclusive view of Latin American identity by giving indios, mestizos, negros, and mulatos a place alongside criollos in the task of building a truly free Latin America. According to Marti, the ongoing failure of the United States to grant equality to Native Americans and former slaves in the construction of its America was just as dangerous to imitate as the European political model. Unfortunately, Martí died young in the Cuban war to gain political independence from Spain, but as an idealist he believed that powerful ideas like liberty must play an equal role in freeing Latin America from the imperialistic impulses of both Europe and the United States.

4. Twentieth Century

A backlash against the intellectual hegemony of positivism marks the beginning of the twentieth century in Latin America. The “scientific” nature of positivism was charged with being “scientistic;” materialism was challenged by new forms of idealism and vitalism; and evolutionism was criticized by various social and political philosophies that supported revolution. As the century wore on, there was a dramatic proliferation of philosophical currents so that speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole becomes increasingly difficult. Ironically, this difficulty arises during the very same period that the term “Latin America” first began to achieve widespread use in public and academic discourse, and the period that the first historical treatments of Latin American philosophy appeared. In response to the problems inherent in speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole, scholars have narrowed their scope by writing about the history of twentieth century philosophy in a particular Latin American country (especially Mexico, Argentina, or Brazil); in a particular region (for example, Central America or the Caribbean); in a particular philosophical tradition (for example, Marxism, phenomenology, existentialism, neo-scholasticism, historicism, philosophy of liberation, analytic philosophy, or feminist philosophy); or in and through a list of important figures. Alternatively, attempts to provide a more panoramic vision of Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century typically proceed by delineating somewhere between three and six generations or periods. For the sake of continuity in scope and detail, the present article utilizes this method and follows a six-generation schema that assigns a rough year to each generation based upon when they were writing rather than when they were born (modeled upon Beorlegui 2006).

a. Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism

The members of the first twentieth-century generational group of 1900 are often called “the generation of founders” or “the generation of patriarchs,” following the influential terminology of Francisco Romero or Francisco Miró Quesada, respectively. Members of this generation include José Enrique Rodó (1871-1917) and Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) in Uruguay, Alejandro Korn (1860-1936) in Argentina; Alejandro Deústua (1849-1945) in Peru; Raimundo de Farias Brito (1862-1917) in Brazil; Enrique José Varona (1849-1933) in Cuba; and Enrique Molina Garmendia (1871-1964) in Chile. The year of 1900 conveniently refers to the change of century and marks the publication of Rodó’s Ariel, which exerted tremendous influence on other Latin American intellectuals. Like those that had come before them, Rodó and the other members of this generation did not write primarily for other philosophers but rather for a broader public in an attempt to influence the courses of their countries. Like Jose Martí, Rodó criticized a particular form of positivism or materialism, which he associated with the United States or Anglo-Saxon America and presented in the barbaric character of “Caliban” from Shakespeare’s The Tempest. In contrast, Rodó presents the civilized “Ariel” as the Latin American spirit of idealism that values art, sentiment, philosophy, and critical thinking. Rodó thus recommends a return to the classical values of ancient Greece and the best of contemporary European (especially French) philosophy. This recommendation is presented in contrast to what Rodó calls nordomanía or the manic delatinization of America, that is, the growing but unthinking imitation of the United States, its plutocracy, and its reductively material and individualist understandings of success.

b. Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions

The members of the generation of 1915 are often grouped with the previous generation of “founders” or “patriarchs” but they are presented here separately because they represent a growing interest in the mestizo or indigenous dimensions of Latin American identity. As it had since colonial times, Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century continued to connect many of its philosophical and political problems to the identity of its peoples. But in light of events like the Mexican revolution that began in 1910, some thinkers began to rebel against the historical tendency to view mestizos and indigenous peoples as negative elements to be overcome through ongoing assimilation and European immigration. Principal members of this generation include Antonio Caso (1883-1946), José Vasconcelos (1882-1959), and Alfonso Reyes (1889-1959) in Mexico; Pedro Henríquez Ureña (1884-1946) in Dominican Republic; Cariolano Alberini (1886-1960) in Argentina; Víctor Raúl Haya de la Torre (1895-1979) and José Carlos Mariátegui (1894-1930) in Peru. The first four thinkers just listed were members of the famous Atheneum of Youth, an intellectual and artistic group founded in 1909 that is crucial for understanding Mexican culture in the twentieth century. Drawing upon Rodó’s Ariel—as well as other American and European philosophers including Henri Bergson (1859–1941), Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900), and William James (1842-1910)—the Atheneum developed a sweeping criticism of the reigning positivism of the científicos and began to take Latin American philosophy in new directions. The members of the Atheneum also explicitly linked their intellectual revolution to Mexico’s social revolution, thereby recapitulating the nineteenth century concern to achieve both political independence and mental emancipation. Jose Vasconcelos’ most famous work, The Cosmic Race (1925), presents a vision of Mexico and Latin America more generally as the birthplace of a new mixed race whose mission would be to usher in a new age by ethnically and spiritually fusing all of the existing races. Vasconcelos subsumed the 1910 Mexican Revolution in a larger world-historical vision of the New World in which Mexicans and other Latin American peoples would redeem humanity from its long history of violence, achieve political stability, and undertake the integral spiritual development of humankind (replacing prevailing notions of human progress as merely materialistic or technological).

Focusing on Indians rather than mestizos, José Carlos Mariátegui offered a vision of Peru and Indo-America (his preferred term for Latin America) that would reverse the disastrous social and economic effects of the conquest. One of the most important Marxist thinkers in the history of Latin America, Mariátegui tied the future of Peru to the socialist liberation of its indigenous peasants, who made up the vast majority of the country’s population and whose lives were only made worse by national independence. Unlike orthodox scientific Marxists, Mariátegui believed that aesthetics and spirituality had a key role to play in fueling the revolution by uniting various marginalized peoples in the belief that they could create a new, more egalitarian society. Furthermore, Mariátegui grounded his analysis in the historical and cultural conditions of the Andean region, which had developed indigenous forms of agrarian communism destroyed by the Spanish colonizers. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality, published in 1928, highlights the Indian character of Peru and offers a structural interpretation of the ongoing exploitation of indigenous peoples as rooted in the usurpation of their communal lands. Mariátegui argued that administrative, educational, and humanitarian approaches to overcoming the suffering of Indians will necessarily fail unless they overcome the local racialized class system that operates in the larger context of global capitalism.

c. Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy

The members of the third twentieth-century generational group of 1930 are often called the “forgers” or the “shapers” (depending upon the translation of Miró Quesada’s influential term forjadores). Members include Samuel Ramos (1897-1959) and José Gaos (1900-1969) in Mexico; Francisco Romero (1891-1962) and Carlos Astrada (1894-1970) in Argentina; and Juan David García Bacca (1901-1992) in Venezuela. After the first two generations of “founders” or “patriarchs” had criticized positivism in order to develop their own personal versions of the philosophic enterprise, the forjadores developed the philosophical foundations and institutions that they took to be necessary for bringing their authentically Latin American philosophical projects to the far better-recognized level of European philosophy. Mariátegui can be understood as a precursor in this respect, since his philosophical influences were primarily European, but his philosophy was rooted in a distinctively Peruvian reality. In their quest to philosophize from a distinctively Latin American perspective, many of the forjadores were greatly influenced by the “perspectivism” of the Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955). Ortega’s impact on Latin American philosophy only increased—particularly in Mexico, Argentina, and Venezuela—with the arrival of Spaniards exiled during the Spanish Civil War (1936-1939). José Gaos was undoubtedly the most influential of these transterrados (transplants), who helped found new educational institutions, publish new academic journals, establish new publishing houses, and translate hundreds of works in Ancient and European philosophy.

The long philosophical career of Juan David García Bacca illustrates the shifting philosophical currents and geographic displacements that forged new developments in Latin American philosophy. Author of over five hundred philosophical works and translations, García Bacca received his philosophical training in Spain, largely under the influence of neo-scholasticism until Ortega woke him from his dogmatic slumber. García Bacca spent the first years of his exile (1938-1941) in Quito, Ecuador, where he began to deconstruct the Aristotelian or Thomistic conception of human nature and replace it with an understanding of man as historical, technological, and transfinite. In other words, García Bacca presented human beings as finite creatures who are nevertheless godlike in their infinite capacity to recreate themselves. In 1941, García Bacca accepted an invitation from the National Autonomous University of Mexico (UNAM) to teach a course on the philosophy of the influential German existentialist and phenomenologist Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). In 1946, García Bacca along with other transterrados founded the Department of Philosophy at the Central University of Venezuela, where he continued to work out his philosophy in dialogue with the traditions of historicism, vitalism, phenomenology, hermeneutics, and existentialism. Following a broad intellectual trend in Latin America after the Cuban revolution of 1959, his understanding of the Latin American context was transformed under the influence of Marxism beginning in the 1960s. García Bacca gave his understanding of human nature as transfinite a substantially new twist by requiring nothing less than the transformation of human nature under socialism. Once again indicating broad intellectual trends in the 1980s, García Bacca began distancing himself somewhat from Marxism and contributed greatly to the history of philosophy in Latin America by publishing substantial anthologies of philosophical thought in Venezuela and Colombia. 

d. Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy

Given the tremendous progress in the institutionalization of Latin American philosophy from roughly 1940 until 1960, this period is frequently referred to as that of “normalization” (again following the influential periodization of Francisco Romero). The generation that benefited was the first to consistently receive formal academic training in philosophy in order to become professors in an established system of universities. These philosophers developed an increasing consciousness of Latin American philosophical identity, aided in part by increased travel and dialogue between Latin American countries and universities (some of it forced under politically oppressive conditions that led to exile). Members of this fourth generation include Risieri Frondizi (1910-1985) and Augusto Salazar Bondy (1925-1974) in Argentina; Miguel Reale (1910-2006) in Brazil; Francisco Miró Quesada (1918- ) in Peru; Arturo Ardao (1912-2003) in Uruguay; and Leopoldo Zea (1912-2004) and Luis Villoro (1922- ) in Mexico. Building upon the philosophies of their teachers, as well as the philosophical conception of hispanidad that many inherited from the Spanish philosophers Miguel de Unamuno (1864-1936) and Ortega y Gasset, this generation developed a critical philosophical perspective that is often called “Latin Americanism.” The philosophy of Leopold Zea is widely taken to be exemplary of this approach. Under the influence of Samuel Ramos and the direction of Jose Gaós at the UNAM, Zea defended his 1944 dissertation on the rise and fall of positivism in Mexico, later translated as Positivism in Mexico (1974). In 1949, Zea founded the famous Hyperion Group of philosophers seeking to shed light upon Mexican identity and reality. Convinced that the past must be known and understood in order to construct an authentic future, Zea went on to situate his work in a panoramic philosophical view of Latin American history, drawing upon the earlier works of Bolívar, Alberdi, Martí, and many others. Zea’s extensive travels and ongoing professional dialogue with other Latin American philosophers across the Continent resulted in many works, including one translated as The Latin American Mind (1963). He also edited a series of works by other scholars on the history of ideas across Latin America, published by El Fondo de Cultura Económica, Mexico’s largest publishing house. Anticipating themes that marked future generations of Latin American philosophy, Zea’s later works such as Latin America and the World (1969) thematized the concepts of marginalization and liberation while situating Latin American philosophy in a global context. In short, Zea consistently sought to develop a Latin American philosophy that would be capable of grasping Latin America’s concrete history and present circumstances in an authentic, responsible, and ultimately universal way.

Zea’s quest for an authentic Latin American philosophy emerged as part of a larger debate over the nature of Latin American philosophy and whether it was something more than an imitation of European philosophy. An examination of one of Zea’s most famous opponents in this debate—Augusto Salazar Bondy—will help set the stage for the subsequent discussion of the philosophies of liberation that emerged in the 1970s with the next philosophical generation. Bondy lays out his position in his book, ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra América? (1968) [Does a Philosophy of Our America Exist?]. Bondy attacks what he takes to be Zea’s ungrounded idealism and maintains that the existence of an authentic Latin American philosophy is inseparable from the concrete socioeconomic conditions of Latin America, which place it in a situation of dependence and economic underdevelopment in relation to Europe and the United States. This in turn produces a “defective culture” in which inauthentic intellectual works are mistaken for authentic philosophical productions. The problem is not that Latin American philosophy fails to be rooted in concrete reality (a problem that Zea works painstakingly to overcome), but rather that it is concretely rooted in an alienated and divided socioeconomic reality. According to Bondy, the authenticity of Latin American philosophy depends upon the liberation of Latin America from the economic production of its cultural dependence. At the same time, Bondy argues for the inauthenticity of philosophy in Europe and the United States insofar as they depend upon the domination of the Third World. In sum, whereas Zea calls for an authentic philosophical development in Latin America that would critically assimilate the deficiencies of the past, Bondy maintains that liberation from economic domination and cultural dependence is a prerequisite for authentic Latin American philosophy in the future.

Before turning to the next philosophical generation and their philosophies of liberation, it is important to note that there are other major philosophical strands that emerged during the period of normalization (1940-1960). While the period is generally associated with Latin Americanism—which drew upon historicism, existentialism, and phenomenology—other philosophical traditions including Marxism, neo-scholasticism, and analytic philosophy also grew in importance. Important early Latin American analytic philosophers include Vicente Ferreira da Silva (1916-1963) in Brazil, who published work in mathematical logic; Mario Bunge (1919- ) in Argentina and then Canada, who has published extensively in almost all major areas of analytic philosophy; and Héctor-Neri Castañeda (1924-1991) in Guatemala and then the United States, who was a student Wilfrid Sellars (1912-1989) and founded one of the top journals in analytic philosophy, Noûs. Analytic philosophy was further institutionalized in Latin America during the 1960s, especially in Argentina and Mexico, followed by Brazil in the 1970s. In Argentina, Gregorio Kilmovsky (1922-2009) cultivated interest in the philosophy of science, Tomás Moro Simpson (1929- ) did important work in the philosophy of language, and Carlos Alchourrón’s (1931-1996) work on logic and belief revision had an international impact on analytic philosophy and computer science. In Mexico, the Institute of Philosophical Investigations (IIF) and the journal Crítica were both founded in 1967 and continue to serve as focal points for analytic philosophy in Latin America. Notable philosophers at the IIF include Fernando Salmerón (1925-1997), whose major influence was in ethics; Alejandro Rossi (1932-2009), who worked in philosophy of language; and Luis Villoro (1922- ), who works primarily in epistemology and political philosophy. The development of analytic philosophy in Brazil was shaken by the 1964 coup, but resumed in the 1970s. Newton da Costa (1929- ) developed several non-classical logics, most famously paraconsistent logic where certain contradictions are allowed. Oswaldo Chateaubriand (1940- ) has done internationally recognized work in logic, metaphysics, and philosophy of language. Since then, analytic philosophy has continued to grow and develop in Latin America, leading more recently to the 2007 founding of the Asociación Latinoamericana de Filosofía Analítica, whose mission is to promote analytic philosophy through scholarly conferences and other exchanges across Latin America.

e. Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation

After the 1960s, philosophy as a professional academic discipline was well established in Latin America, but it only began to achieve substantial international visibility in the 1970s with the rise of a new generation that developed the philosophy of liberation. The most famous members of this fifth twentieth century generation are from Argentina and include Arturo Andrés Roig (1922-2012), Enrique Dussel (1934- ), and Horacio Cerutti Guldberg (1950- ). The strain of liberation philosophy developed by Ignacio Ellacuría (1930-1989) in El Salvador also stands out as exemplary. In a context marked by violence and political repression, the public philosophical positions of these liberatory thinkers put their lives in jeopardy. Most tragically, Ellacuría was assassinated by a military death squad while chairing the philosophy department of El Salvador’s Universidad Centroamericana. The substantial international impact of the Argentine philosophers of liberation stems in part from their political exile due to the military and state terrorism that characterized the “Dirty War” from 1972-1983. Much like the earlier Spanish transterrados, these philosophers developed and spread their philosophies from their newly adopted countries (Ecuador in the case of Roig, and Mexico in the cases of Dussel and Cerutti Guldberg). Although it should not be confused with the better-known tradition of Latin American liberation theology, Latin American philosophies of liberation emerged from a similar historical and intellectual context that included: a recovery of Latin America’s longstanding preoccupation with political liberation and intellectual independence, the influence of dependency theory in economics, a careful engagement with Marxism, and an emphasis on praxis rooted in an ethical commitment to the liberation of poor or otherwise oppressed groups in the Third World. Yet another parallel strain of Latin American liberationist thought focusing on pedagogy emerged based upon the work of Brazilian philosopher and educator Paulo Freire (1921-1997). Imprisoned and then exiled from Brazil during the military coup of 1964, he developed a vision and method for teaching oppressed peoples (who were often illiterate) how to theorize and practice their own liberation from the dehumanizing socioeconomic conditions that had been imposed upon them. Freire’s book Pedagogy of the Oppressed (1970) drew international attention and became a foundational text in what is now called critical pedagogy.

While Cerutti Guldberg has written the most complete work explaining the intellectual splits that produced different philosophies of liberation—Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana (2006)—Dussel’s name and work are most widely known given his tremendous efforts to promote the philosophy of liberation through dialogue with famous European philosophers including Karl-Otto Apel (1922- ) and Jurgen Habermas (1929) as well as famous North American philosophers including Richard Rorty (1931-2007) and Charles Taylor (1931- ). By analyzing the relationship between Latin American cultural-intellectual dependence and socioeconomic oppression, Dussel seeks to develop transformational conceptions and practices leading to liberation from both of these conditions. Dussel argues that the progress of European philosophy through the centuries has come at the expense of the vast majority of humanity, whose massive poverty has only rarely appeared as a fundamental philosophical theme. Dussel’s best-known early work Philosophy of Liberation (1980) attempts to foreground, diagnose, and transform the oppressive socioeconomic and intellectual systems that are largely controlled by European and North American interests and power groups at the expense of Third World regions including Latin America. Instead of only pretending to be universal, at the expense of most people who are largely ignored, historical and philosophical progress must be rooted in a global dialogue committed to recognizing and listening to the least heard on their own terms. Influenced by the French philosopher Immanuel Levinas (1906-1995), Dussel highlights the importance of this ethical method, which he calls analectical to contrast it with the totalizing tendencies of the Hegelian dialectic. A prolific author of more than fifty books, Dussel’s later work attempts to systematically develop philosophical principles for a critical ethics of liberation alongside a critical politics of liberation. Dussel’s 1998 book, Ethics of Liberation in the Age of Globalization and Exclusion (translated in 2013), is often cited as an important later work.

While not typically categorized as part of the philosophy of liberation in the narrow sense, Latin American feminist philosophy is an important but typically under-recognized form of emancipatory thought that has existed in academic form for at least a century. In 1914, Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) began publicly analyzing and discussing the importance of civil and political rights for women, as well as women’s access to education and professional careers. Vaz Ferreira’s feminist philosophy was published as Sobre feminismo in 1933, the same year that woman gained the right to vote in Uruguay. Given that Vaz Ferreira belongs to the first twentieth century generation of the “patriarchs” of Latin American philosophy, it is worth emphasizing that women were systematically marginalized from the academic discipline of philosophy until much later in the twentieth century, when the feminist movements of the 1970s led to the institutionalization of Women’s Studies or Gender Studies in Latin American universities in the 1980s and 1990s. An important connecting tissue for these movements has been the Encuentros Feminista Latinoamericano y del Caribe, an ongoing series of biennial (later triennial) meetings of Latin American women and feminist activists, first held in 1981 in Bogotá, Colombia. While the diversity that characterizes feminism makes it problematic to make generalized comparisons between Latin American feminism and feminism in Europe and the United States, Latin American feminists have tended to be more concerned with the context of family life and to giving equal importance to ethnicity and class as categories of analysis (Femenías and Oliver 2007). 

One of the earliest and most influential Latin American feminist philosophers was Graciela Hierro (1928-2003), who introduced feminist philosophy into the academic curriculum of the UNAM beginning in the 1970s and organized the first panel on feminism at a national Mexican philosophy conference in 1979. Hierro is best remembered for the feminist ethics of pleasure that she developed beginning with her book Ética y feminismo (1985). Criticizing the “double sexual morality” that assigns asymmetrical moral roles based upon gender, Hierro argues for a hedonistic sexual ethic rooted in a love of self that makes prudence, solidarity, justice, and equity possible. The rise of feminist philosophy alongside other feminist social and intellectual movements in Latin America has also led to the recovery and popularization of writings by marginalized women thinkers, including the work of Sor Juana de la Cruz (1651-1695) discussed above. Another important intellectual resource has been the development of oral history projects or testimonios that seek to document the lives and ideas of countless women living in poverty or obscurity. One of the most famous books in this genre is I, Rigoberta Menchú (1983), the testimonial autobiography of a Quiche Mayan woman, Rigoberta Menchú Tum (1959- ), who began fighting for the rights of women and indigenous people in Guatemala as a teenager and went on to win a Nobel Peace Prize in 1992.

f. Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism

The sixth and last generation of twentieth century Latin American philosophers emerged in the 1980s. While speaking of broad trends is always somewhat misleading given the diversity of approaches and interests, one interesting trend lies in how Latin American philosophers from this generation have contributed to the analysis and criticism of globalization by participating in new intellectual debates concerning postmodernism in the 1980s and postcolonialism in the 1990s. For example, some new philosophers of liberation like Raul Fornet-Betancourt (1946- ) sought to revise fundamental theoretical dichotomies such as center/periphery, domination/liberation, and First World/Third World that were critical in terms of their general thrust but insufficiently nuanced in light of the complex phenomena that go by the name of globalization. Fornet-Betancourt’s own biography points to this complexity, since he was born in Cuba but moved to Germany in 1972, earning his college degree and first PhD in philosophy in Spain, then returning to complete a second PhD in theology and linguistics in Germany, where he is currently a professor who publishes extensively in both German and Spanish. Self-critical of much of his own philosophical training and development, Fornet-Betancourt has rooted himself in Latin American philosophy in order to devise an intercultural approach to understanding philosophy in light of the diverse histories and cultures that have produced human wisdom across time and space. In contrast to globalization, which is a function of a global political economy that does not tolerate differences or alternatives to a global monoculture of capitalism and consumption, Fornet-Betancourt outlines the economic and political conditions that would make genuinely symmetrical intercultural dialogue and exchange possible.

Drawing critically upon discussions of globalization and postmodernism, the discourse of postcolonialism emerged in the final decade of the twentieth century. The basic idea is that globalization has produced a new transnational system of economic colonialism that is distinct from but related to the national and international forms of colonialism that characterized the world between the conquest of America and the Second World War. Among other things, postcolonialism addresses the politics of knowledge in globalized world that is unified by complex webs of exclusion based upon gender, class, race, ethnicity, language, and sexuality. One of the fundamental criticisms leveled by postcolonialism is the way that neo-colonial discourses routinely and violently construct homogeneous wholes like “The Third World” or “Latin America” out of heterogeneous peoples, places, and their cultures. Like postmodernism, postcolonial theory did not initially come from or focus on Latin America, so there is considerable debate about whether or how postcolonial theory should be developed in a Latin American context. A variant of this debate has occurred among Latin American feminists who do not generally view themselves as part of postcolonial feminism, which has been charged with overlooking tremendous differences between the former English and French colonies and the former Spanish and Portuguese colonies (Schutte and Femenías 2010). One of the best-known Latin American thinkers who works critically in conjunction with postcolonial studies is Walter Mignolo (1941- ). He was born in Argentina, where he completed his B.A. in philosophy before moving to Paris to obtain his Ph.D., eventually becoming a professor in the United States. Rather than apply foreign postcolonial theory to the Latin American context, Mignolo has mined the history of Latin America for authors who found ways to challenge or subversively employ the rules of colonial discourse, for example, the native Andean intellectual and artist Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616) discussed above. Mignolo’s book, The Idea of Latin America (2005), excavates the history of how the idea of Latin America came about in order to show how it still rests upon colonial foundations that must be transformed by decolonial theory and practice.

5. Twenty-First Century

a. Plurality of Philosophies in Latin America

In the early twenty-first century, Latin America became home to the ongoing development and institutionalization of many philosophical traditions and approaches including analytic philosophy, Latin Americanism, phenomenology, existentialism, hermeneutics, Marxism, neo-scholasticism, feminism, history of philosophy, philosophy of liberation, postmodernism, and postcolonialism. At the same time, the very idea of Latin America has been posed as a major problem (Mignolo 2005), following historically in the wake of the still unresolved controversy over how philosophy itself should be understood. While the dominant philosophical currents and trends differ both across and within various Latin American countries and regions, all of the major philosophical approaches that predominate in Europe and the United States are well-represented.

b. Normalization of Latin American Philosophy in the United States

The term “Latin American philosophy” has also gained widespread use and attracted considerable research interest in the United States. This is due in large measure to the efforts of a generation of Latino and Latina philosophers who were born in Latin America and went on to become professors in the United States where they teach and publish in better-established philosophical fields as well as in Latin American philosophy. These philosophers include Walter Mignolo (1941- ), María Lugones (1948- ), and Susana Nuccetelli (1954-) from Argentina; Jorge J. E. Gracia (1942- ) and Ofelia Schutte (1945- ) from Cuba; Linda Martín Alcoff (1955- ) from Panama; and Eduardo Mendieta (1963- ) from Colombia. Their philosophical interests and approaches to Latin American philosophy vary greatly and include postcolonial theory, feminism, metaphysics, epistemology, critical philosophy of race, philosophy of liberation, philosophy of language, metaphilosophy, continental philosophy, and critical theory. This generation has also made important contributions to the analysis of, and debate over, Hispanic or Latino/a identity in the United States, especially as it intersects with other complex dimensions of identity including race, ethnicity, nationality, class, language, gender, and sexual orientation.

Borrowing a term from the history of Latin American philosophy, we may eventually be able to speak of the early twenty-first century as the period of normalization for Latin American philosophy in the United States. Given the accomplishments of the generation of mostly Latino and Latina founders, a few philosophy graduate students in the United States have been the first presented with opportunities to receive some formal training in Latin American philosophy and to make it a major part of their research agenda early in their careers. Moreover, the first handful of job listings at universities in the United States have emerged calling for professors who specialize in Latin American philosophy. The early twenty-first century has also been marked by an increasing number of English-language articles and books on Latin American philosophy. Nevertheless, if this trend toward more development of Latin American philosophy is to continue, then large hurdles remain, including a major shortage of primary Latin American philosophical texts available in English translation, a widespread lack of knowledge concerning Latin American philosophy among most professional philosophers in the United States, and the resulting need for most U.S. philosophers interested in Latin American philosophy to maintain an active research agenda and publication record in at least one better-recognized philosophical area or field.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alberdi, Juan Bautista. “Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina.” Translated by Janet Burke and Ted Humphrey. In Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
  • Alcoff, Linda Martín. Visible Identities: Race, Gender, and the Self. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Arciniegas, Germán. Latin America: A Cultural History. Translated by Joan MacLean. New York: Knopf, 1966.
  • Beorlegui, Carlos. Historia del pensamiento filosofico latinoamericano: una busqueda incesante de la identidad. Bilbao: Universidad de Deusto, 2006.
  • Beorlegui, Carlos . “La Filosofía de Jd García Bacca.” Isegoría, no. 7 (1993): 151-64.
  • Bolívar, Simón. El Libertador: Writings of Simón Bolívar. Translated by Frederick H. Fornoff. Edited by David Bushnell. New York: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Bondy, Augusto Salazar. ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra américa? México: Siglo XXI, 1968.
  • Burke, Janet, and Ted Humphrey, eds. Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
  • Cerutti Guldberg, Horacio. Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana. México: Fondo de Cultura Económica, 2006.
  • Chasteen, John Charles. Born in Blood & Fire: A Concise History of Latin America. New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 2011.
  • Costa, João Cruz. A History of Ideas in Brazil: The Development of Philosophy in Brazil and the Evolution of National History. Translated by Suzette Macedo. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964.
  • Crawford, William Rex. A Century of Latin-American Thought. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1961.
  • de la Cruz, Sor Juana Inés. The Answer / La Respuesta. Edited and Translated by Electa Arenal and Amanda Powell. New York: Feminist Press at the City University of New York, 2009.
  • de las Casas, Bartolomé. In Defense of the Indians. Translated by Stafford Poole. DeKalb: Northern Illinois University Press, 1992.
  • Dussel, Enrique. Ethics of Liberation: In the Age of Globalization and Exclusion. Translated by Alejandro A. Vallega and Eduardo Mendieta. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2013.
  • Dussel, Enrique . Philosophy of Liberation. Translated by Aquilina Martinez and Christine Morkovsky. Eugene, OR: Wipf & Stock Publishers, 1980.
  • Dussel, Enrique . Politics of Liberation: A Critical Global History. Translated by Thia Cooper. Canterbury: SCM Press, 2011.
  • Dussel, Enrique, Eduardo Mendieta, and Carmen Bohórquez, eds. El pensamiento filosofico latinoamericano, del Caribe y “latino” (1300-2000): historia, corrientes, temas y filósofos. México: Siglo XXI, 2009.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio. Ignacio Ellacuria: Essays on History, Liberation, and Salvation. Edited by Michael E. Lee. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis Books, 2013.
  • Femenías, María Luisa, and Amy A. Oliver, eds. Feminist Philosophy in Latin America and Spain. New York: Rodopi, 2007.
  • Fornet-Betancourt, Raúl. Transformación intercultural de la filosofía: ejercicios teóricos y prácticos de filosofía intercultural desde latinoamérica en el contexto de la globalización. Bilbao: Desclée de Brouwer, 2001.
  • Freire, Paulo. Pedagogy of the Oppressed. Translated by Myra Bergman Ramos. New York: Herder and Herder, 1970.
  • García Bacca, Juan David. Antología del pensamiento filosófico venezolano. Caracas: Ediciones del Ministerio de Educación, 1954.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E. Hispanic / Latino Identity: A Philosophical Perspective. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 1999.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E., ed. Latin American Philosophy Today. A Special Double Issue of The Philosophical Forum. Vol. 20:1-2, 1988-89.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E.. Philosophical Analysis in Latin America. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1984.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E., and Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert. Latin American Philosophy for the 21st Century: The Human Condition, Values, and the Search for Identity. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2004.
  • Guaman Poma de Ayala, Felipe The First New Chronicle and Good Government [Abridged]. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 2006.
  • Hierro, Graciela. Ética y feminismo. México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 1985.
  • Hierro, Graciela . La ética del placer. México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 2001.
  • Ivan, Marquez, ed. Contemporary Latin American Social and Political Thought: An Anthology. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2008.
  • Mariátegui, José Carlos. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality. Translated by Marjory Urquidi. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1971.
  • Martí, José. José Martí Reader: Writings on the Americas. Edited by Deborah Scnookal and Mirta Muñiz. Melbourne: Ocean Press, 2007.
  • Mendieta, Eduardo, ed. Latin American Philosophy: Currents, Issues, Debates. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003.
  • Mignolo, Walter D. The Darker Side of the Renaissance: Literacy, Territoriality, and Colonization. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1995.
  • Mignolo, Walter D . The Idea of Latin America. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2005.
  • Moraña, Mabel, Enrique Dussel, and Carlos A. Jáuregui, eds. Coloniality at Large: Latin America and the Postcolonial Debate. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2008.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana, Ofelia Schutte, and Otávio Bueno, eds. A Companion to Latin American Philosophy. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2010.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana, and Gary Seay. Latin American Philosophy: An Introduction with Readings. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson, 2003.
  • Nuccetelli, Susanna. Latin American Thought: Philosophical Problems and Arguments. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2002.
  • Portilla, Miguel León. Aztec Thought and Culture: A Study of the Ancient Nahuatl Mind. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963.
  • Rodó, José Enrique. Ariel. Translated by Margaret Sayers Peden. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1988.
  • Salles, Arleen, and Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert. The Role of History in Latin American Philosophy: Contemporary Perspectives. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2006.
  • Sánchez Reulet, Aníbal. Contemporary Latin American Philosophy: A Selection with Introduction and Notes. Translated by Willard R. Trask. Albuquerque: The University of New Mexico Press, 1954.
  • Schutte, Ofelia. Cultural Identity and Social Liberation in Latin American Thought. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1993.
  • Schutte, Ofelia, and María Luisa Femenías. “Feminist Philosophy.” In A Companion to Latin American Philosophy, edited by Susana Nuccetelli, Ofelia Schutte and Otávio Bueno. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2010.
  • Sierra, Justo. The Political Evolution of the Mexican People. Translated by Charles Ramsdell. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1976.
  • Vasconcelos, José. The Cosmic Race: A Bilingual Edition. Translated by Didier T. Jaén. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997.
  • Vaz Ferreira, Carlos. Sobre feminismo. Buenos Aires: Editorial Losada, 1945.
  • Zea, Leopoldo. The Latin-American Mind. Translated by James H. Abbott and Lowell Dunham. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . Latin America and the World. Translated by Beatrice Berler and Frances Kellam Hendricks. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1969.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . Positivism in Mexico. Translated by Josephine H. Schulte. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1974.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . The Role of the Americas in History. Translated by Sonja Karsen. Edited by Amy A. Oliver. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1991.


Author Information

Alexander V. Stehn
University of Texas-Pan American
U. S. A.

Metaphor and Phenomenology

 The term “contemporary phenomenology” refers to a wide area of 20th and 21st century philosophy in which the study of the structures of consciousness occupies center stage. Since the appearance of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason and subsequent developments in phenomenology and hermeneutics after Husserl, it has no longer been possible to view consciousness as a simple scientific object of study. It is, in fact, the precondition for any sort of meaningful experience, even the simple apprehension of objects in the world. While the basic features of phenomenological consciousness – intentionality, self-awareness, embodiment, and so forth—have been the focus of analysis, Continental philosophers such as Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida go further in adding a linguistically creative dimension. They argue that metaphor and symbol act as the primary interpreters of reality, generating richer layers of perception, expression, and meaning in speculative thought. The interplay of metaphor and phenomenology introduces serious challenges and ambiguities within long-standing assumptions in the history of Western philosophy, largely with respect to the strict divide between the literal and figurative modes of reality based in the correspondence theory of truth. Since the end of the 20th century, the role of metaphor in the production of cognitive structures has been taken up and extended in new productive directions, including “naturalized phenomenology” and straightforward cognitive science, notably in the work of G. Lakoff and M. Johnson, M. Turner, D. Zahavi, and S. Gallagher.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview
    1. The Conventional View: Aristotle’s Contribution to Substitution Model
    2. The Philosophical Issues
    3. Nietzsche’s Role in Development of Phenomenological Theories of Metaphor
  2. The Phenomenological Theory in Continental Philosophy
    1. Phenomenological Method: Husserl
    2. Heidegger’s Contribution
  3. Existential Phenomenology: Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics, and Metaphor
    1. The Mechanics of Conceptual Blending
    2. The Role of Kant’s Schematism in Conceptual Blending
  4. Jacques Derrida: Metaphor as Metaphysics
    1. The Dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida
  5. Anglo-American Philosophy: Interactionist Theories
  6. Metaphor, Phenomenology, and Cognitive Science
    1. The Embodied Mind
    2. The Literary Mind
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Overview

This article highlights the definitive points in the ongoing philosophical conversation about metaphorical language and it’s centrality in phenomenology. The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, at times presented as a critique, is a radical alternative to the conventional analysis of metaphor. The conventional view, largely inherited from Aristotle, is also known as the “substitution model.” In the traditional, or standard approach, the uses and applications of metaphor have been restricted to (along with other related symbolic phenomena/tropes) the realms of rhetoric and poetics. In this view, metaphor is none other than a kind of categorical mistake, a deviance of sense produced in order to create a lively effect.

While somewhat contested, the standard substitution theory, also referred to as the “similarity theory,” generally defines metaphor as a stylistic literary device involving a deviant and dyadic movement which shifts meaning from one word to another. This view, first and most thoroughly articulated by Aristotle, reinforces the epistemic primacy of the literal, where metaphor can only operate as a secondary device, one which is dependent on the prior level of ordinary descriptive language, where the first-order language in itself contains nothing metaphorical. In most cases, the relation between two orders, literal and figurative, has been interpreted as an implicit simile, which expresses a “this is that” structure. For example, Aristotle mentions, in Poetics: 

When the poet says of Achilles that he “Leapt on the foe as a lion,” this is a simile; when he says of him, “the lion leapt” it is a metaphor—here, since both are courageous, [Homer] has transferred to Achilles the name of “lion.” (1406b 20-3)

In purely conventional terms, poetic language can only be said to refer to itself; that is, it can accomplish imaginative description through metaphorical attribution, but the description does not refer to any reality outside of itself. For the purposes of traditional rhetoric and poetics in the Aristotelian mode, metaphor may serve many purposes; it can be clever, creative, or eloquent, but never true in terms of referring to new propositional content. This is due to the restriction of comparison to substitution, such that the cognitive impact of the metaphoric transfer of meaning is produced by assuming similarities between literal and figurative domains of objects and the descriptive predicates attributed to them.

The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, however, not only challenges the substitution model, it advances the role of metaphor far beyond the limits of traditional rhetoric. In the Continental philosophical tradition, the most extensive developments of metaphor’s place in phenomenology are found in the work of Martin Heidegger, Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida. They all, in slightly different ways, see figurative language as the primary vehicle for the disclosure and creation of new forms of meaning which emerge from an ontological, rather than purely epistemic or objectifying engagement with the world.

a. The Conventional View: Aristotle’s Contribution to Substitution Model

Metaphor consists in giving the thing a name that belongs to something else; the transference being either from species to genus, or from genus to species, or from species to species, on the grounds of analogy. (Poetics 1457b 6-9)

 While his philosophical predecessor Plato condemns the use of figurative speech for its role in rhetorike, “the art of persuasion,” Aristotle recognizes its stylistic merits and provides us with the first systematic analysis of metaphor and its place in literature and the mimetic arts. His briefer descriptions of how metaphors are to be used can be found in Rhetoric and Poetics, while his extended analysis of how metaphor operates within the context of language as a whole can be inferred by reading On Interpretation together with Metaphysics. The descriptive use of metaphor can be understood as an extension of its meaning; the term derives from the Greek metaphora, from metaphero, meaning “to transfer or carry over.” Thus, the figurative trope emerges from a movement of substitution, involving the transference of a word to a new sense, one which compares or juxtaposes seemingly unrelated subjects.  For example, in Shakespeare’s Sonnet 73:

In me thou seest the glowing of such fire,
That on the ashes of his youth doth lie…

The narrator directly transfers and applies the “dying ember” image in a new “foreign” sense: his own awareness of his waning youth.

This is Aristotle’s contribution to the standard substitution model of metaphor. It is to be understood as a linguistic device, widely applied but remaining within the confines of rhetoric and poetry. Though it does play a central role in social persuasion, metaphor, restricted by the mechanics of similarity and substitution, does not carry with it any speculative or philosophical importance. Metaphors may point out underlying similarities between objects and their descriptive categories, and may instruct through adding liveliness and elegance to speech, but they do not refer, in the strong sense, to a form of propositional knowledge.

The formal structure of substitution operates in the following manner: the first subject or entity under description in one context is characterized as equivalent in some way to the second entity derived from another context; it is either implied or stated that the first entity “is” the second entity in some way. The metaphorical attribution occurs when certain select properties from the second entity are imposed on the first in order to characterize it in some distinctive way. Metaphor relies on pre-existing categories which classify objects and their properties; these categories guide the ascription of predicates to objects, and since metaphor may entail a kind of violation of this order, it cannot itself refer to a “real” class of existing objects or the relations between them. Similarly, in poetry, metaphor serves not as a foundation for knowledge, but as a tool for mimesis or artistic imitation, representing the actions in epic tragedy or mythos in order to move and instruct the emotions of the audience for the purpose of catharsis.

Aristotle’s theory and its significance for philosophy can only be fully understood in terms of the wider context of denotation and reference which supports the classical realist epistemology. Metaphor is found within his taxonomy of speech forms; additionally, simile is subordinate to metaphor and both are figures of speech falling under the rubric of lexis/diction, which itself is composed of individual linguistic units or noun-names and verbs. Lexis operates within the unity of logos, meaning that the uses of various forms of speech must conform to the overall unity of language and reason, held together by categorical structures of being found in Aristotle’s metaphysics.

As a result of Aristotle’s combined thinking in these works, it turns out that the ostensive function of naming individual objects (“this” name standing for “this object” or property) allows for the clear demarcation between the literal and figurative meanings for names. Thus, the noun-name can work as a signifier of meaning in two domains, the literal and the non-literal. However, there remains an unresolved problem: the categorical nature of the boundary between literal and figurative domains will be a point of contention for many contemporary critiques of the theory coming from phenomenological philosophy.

Furthermore, the denotative theory has served in support of the referential function of language, one which assumes a system of methodological connections between language, sense perceptions, mental states, and the external world. The referential relation between language and its objects serves the correspondence theory of truth, in that the truth-bearing capacity of language corresponds to valid perception and cognition of the external world. The theory assumes that these sets of correspondences allow for the consistent and reliable relation of reference between words, images, and objects.

Aristotle accounts for this kind of correspondence in the following way: sense perceptions’s pathemata give rise to the psychological states in which object representations are formed. These states are actually likenesses (isomorphisms) of the external objects. Thus, names for things refer to the things themselves, mental representations of those things, and to the class-based meanings.

If, as Aristotle assumes, the meaning of metaphor rests on the level of the noun-name, its distinguishing feature lies in its deviation, a “something which happens” to the noun/name by virtue of a transfer (epiphora) of meaning. Here, Aristotle creates a metaphor (based on physical movement) in order to explain metaphor. The term “phora” refers to a change in location from one place to another, to which is added the prefix “epi:” epiphora refers then to the transfer of the common proper name of the thing to the new, unfamiliar, alien (allotrios) place or object. Furthermore, the transference (or substitution), borrowing as it does the alien name for the thing, does not disrupt the overall unity of meaning or logical order of correspondence within the denotative system; all such movement remains within the classifications of genus and species.

The metaphoric transfer of meaning will become a significant point of debate and speculation in later philosophical discussions. Although Aristotle himself does not explore the latent philosophical questions in his own theory, subsequent philosophers of language have over the years recast these issues, exploring the challenges to meaning, reference, and correspondence that present themselves in the substitution theory. What happens, on these various levels, when we substitute one object or descriptor of a “natural kind,” to a foreign object domain? It may the be the case that metaphorical transference calls into question the limits of all meaning-bearing categories, and in turn, the manner in which words can be said to “refer” to specific objects and their attributes. By virtue of the epiphoric movement, species and genus attributes of disparate objects fall into relations of kinship, opposition, or deviation among the various ontological categories. These relations allow for the metaphoric novelty which will subsequently fuel the development of alternative theories, those which view as fundamental to our cognitive or conceptual processes. At this point the analysis of metaphor opens up the philosophical space for further debate and interpretation.

b. The Philosophical Issues

In any theory of metaphor, there are significant philosophical implications for the transfer of meaning from one object-domain or context of associations to another. The metaphor, unlike its sister-trope the analogy, creates a new form of predication, suggesting that one category or class of objects (with certain characteristics) can be projected onto another separate class of entities; this projection may require a blurring of the ontological and epistemological distinctions between the kinds of objects that can be said to exist, either in the mind or in the external world. Returning to the Shakespearean metaphor above, what are the criteria that we use to determine whether a dying ember aptly fits the state of the narrator’s consciousness? What are the perceptual and ontological connections between fire and human existence? The first problem lies in how we are to explain the initial “fit” between any predicate category and its objects. Another problem comes to the forefront when we try to account for how metaphors enable us to think in new ways. If we are to move beyond the standard substitution model, we are compelled to investigate the specific mental operations that enable us to create metaphoric representations; we need to elaborate upon the processes which connect particular external objects (and their properties) given to sensory experience to linguistic signs “referring” to a new kind of object, knowledge context, or domain of experience.

According to the standard model, a metaphor’s ability to signify is restricted by ordinary denotation. The metaphor, understood as a new name, is conceived as a function of individual terms, rather than sentences or wider forms of discourse (narratives, texts). As Continental phenomenology develops in the late 19th and 20th centuries, we are presented with radically alternative theories which obscure strict boundaries between the literal and the figurative, disrupting the connections between perception, language, and thought. Namely, the phenomenological, interactionist, and cognitive treatments of metaphor defend the view that metaphorical language and symbol serve as indirect routes to novel ways of knowing and describing human experience. In their own ways, these theories will call into question the validity and usefulness of correspondence and reference, especially in theoretical disciplines such as philosophy, theology, literature, and science.

Although this article largely focuses on explicating phenomenological theories of metaphor, it should be noted that in all three theories mentioned above, metaphor is displaced from its formerly secondary position in substitution theory to occupying the front and center of our cognitive capabilities. Understood as the product of intentional structures in the mind, metaphor now becomes conceptual, rather than merely ornamental, acting as a conduit through which we take apart and re-assemble the concepts we use to describe the varieties and nuances of experience. They all share in the assumption that metaphors suggest, posit, or disclose similarities between objects and domains of experience (where there seem to be none), without explicitly recognizing that a comparison is being made between two sometimes very different kinds of things or events. These theories, when applied to our original metaphor (“in me thou seest…”) contend that at times, there need not be any explicit similarity between states of awareness or existence as “fire” or “ashes”.

c. Nietzsche’s Role in Development of Phenomenological Theories of Metaphor

In Nietzsche’s thought we see an early turning away from the substitution theory and its reliance on the correspondence theory of truth, denotation, and reference. His description of metaphor takes us back to its primordial “precognitive” or ontological origins; Nietzsche acts here as a pre-cursor to later developments, yet in itself his analysis offers a compelling account of the power of metaphor. Though his remarks on metaphor are somewhat scattered, they can be found in the early writings of 1872-74, Nachgelassene Fragmente, and “On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense” (see W. Kaufman’s translation in The Portable Nietzsche). Together with the “Rhetorik” lectures, these writings argue for a genealogical explanation of the conceptual, displacing traditional philosophical categories into the metaphorical realm. In doing so, he deconstructs our conventional reliance on the idea that meaningful language must reflect a system of logical correspondences.

With correspondence, we can only assume we are in possession of the truth when our representations or ideas about the world “match up” with external states of affairs. We have already seen how Aristotle’s system of first-order predication supports correspondence, as it is enabled through the denotative ascription of predicates/categorical features of /to objects. But Nietzsche boldly suggests that we are, from the outset, already in metaphor and he works from this starting point. The concepts and judgments we use to describe reality do not flatly reflect pre-existing similarities or causal relationships between themselves and our physical intuitions about reality, they are themselves metaphorical constructions; that is, they are creative forms of differentiation emerging out of a deeper undifferentiated primordiality of being. The truth of the world is more closely reflected in the Dionysian level of pure aesthetic immersion into an “undecipherable” innermost essence of things.

Even in his early work, The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche rejects the long-held assumption that truth is an ordering of concepts expressed through rigid linguistic categories, putting forth the alternative view which gives primacy to symbol as the purest, most elemental form of representation. That which is and must be expressed is produced organically, out of the flux of nature and yielding a “becoming” rather than being.

In the Dionysian dithyramb man is incited to the greatest exaltation of all his symbolic faculties; something never before experienced struggles for utterance—the annihilation of the veil of maya, … oneness as the soul of the race and of nature itself. The essence of nature is now to be expressed symbolically; we need a new world of symbols.… (BOT Ch. 2)

Here, following Schopenhauer, he reverses Aristotelian transference of concept-categories from the literal to the figurative, and makes the figurative the original mode for representation of experience. The class terms “species” and “genus”, based in Aristotle and so important in classical and medieval epistemology, only appear to originate and validate themselves in “dialectics and through scientific reflection.” For Nietzsche, the categories hide their real nature, abiding as frozen metaphors which reflect previously experienced levels of natural experience metaphorically represented in our consciousness. They emerge through construction indirectly based in vague images or names for things, willed into being out of the unnamed flowing elements of biological existence. Even Thales the pre-Socratic, we are reminded, in his attempt to give identity to the underlying unity of all things, falls back on a conceptualization of it as water without realizing he is using a metaphor.

Once we construct and begin to apply our concepts, their metaphorical origins are forgotten or concealed from ordinary awareness. This theoretical process is but another attempt to restore “the also-forgotten” original unity of being. The layering of metaphors, the archeological ancestors of concepts, is specifically linked to our immediate experiential capacity to transcend the proper and the individual levels of experience and linguistic signs. We cannot, argues Nietzsche, construct metaphors without breaking out of the confines of singularity, thus we must reject the artificiality of designating separate names for separate things. To assume that an individual name would completely and transparently describe its referent (in perception) is to also assume that language and external experience mirror one another in some perfect way. It is rather the case that language transfers meaning from place to place. The terms metapherein and Übertragung are equivalently applied here; if external experience is in constant flux, it is not possible to reduplicate exact and individual meanings. To re-describe things through metaphor is to “leave out” and “carry-over” meaning, to undergo a kind of dispossession of self, thing, place, and time and an overcoming of both individualisms and dualities. Thus the meaningful expression of the real is seen and experienced most directly in the endlessly creative activity of art and music, rather than philosophy.

2. The Phenomenological Theory in Continental Philosophy

Versions of Nietzsche’s “metaphorization” of thought will reappear in the Continental philosophers described below; those who owe their phenomenological attitudes to Husserl, but disagree with his transcendental idealization of meaning, one which demands that we somehow separate the world of experience from the essential meanings of objects in that world. Taken together, these philosophers call into question the position that truth entails a relationship of correspondence between dual aspects of reality, one internal to our minds and the other external. We consider Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida as the primary examples. For Heidegger, metaphoric language signals a totality or field of significance in which being discloses or reveals itself. Ricoeur’s work, in turn, builds upon aspects of Heidegger’s ontological hermeneutics, explicating how it is the case that metaphors drive speculative reflection. In Ricoeur’s model, the literal level is subverted, and metaphoric language and symbols containing “semantic kernels” create structures of double reference in all figurative forms of discourse. These structures point beyond themselves in symbols and texts, serving as mediums which reveal new worlds of meaning and existential possibilities.

French philosopher Jacques Derrida, on the other hand, reiterates the Nietzschean position; metaphor does not subvert metaphysics, but rather is itself the hidden source of all conceptual structures.

a. Phenomenological Method: Husserl

Edmund Husserl’s phenomenological method laid the groundwork, in the early 20th century, for what would eventually take shape in the phenomenological philosophies of Martin Heidegger, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Jean-Paul Sartre. Husserl’s early work provides the foundation for exploring how these modes of presentation convey the actual meaningful contents of experience. He means to address here the former distinction made by Kant between the phenomenal appearances of the real (to consciousness) and the noumenal reality of the things-in-themselves. Husserl, broadly speaking, seeks to resolve not only what some see as a problematic dualism in Kant, but also some philosophical problems that accompany Hegel’s constructivist phenomenology.

Taken in its entirety, Husserl’s project demonstrates a major shift in the 20th century phenomenology, seeking a rigorous method for the description and analysis of consciousness and the contents given to it. He intends his method to be the scientific grounding for philosophy; it is to be a critique of psychologism and a return to a universal knowledge of “the things themselves,” those intelligible objects apprehended by and given to consciousness.

In applying this method we seek, Husserl argues, a scientific foundation for universally objective knowledge; adhering to the “pure description” of phenomena given to consciousness through the perception of objects. If those objects are knowable, it is because they are immediate in conscious experience. It is through the thorough description of these objects as they appear to us in terms of color, shape, and so forth, that we apprehend that which is essential – what we call “essences” or meanings. Here, the act of description is a method for avoiding a metaphysical trap: that of imposing these essences or object meanings onto the contents of mental experience. Noesis, for Husserl, achieves its aim by including within itself (giving an account of) the role that context or horizon plays in delineating possible objects for experience. This will have important implications for later phenomenological theories of metaphor, in that metaphors may be said intend new figurative contexts in which being appears to us in new ways.

In Ideen (30), Husserl explains how such a horizon or domain of experience presents a set of criteria for us to apply. We choose and identify an object as a single member of a class of objects, and so these regions of subjective experience, also called regions of phenomena, circumscribe certain totalities or generic unities to which concrete items belong. In order to understand the phenomenological approach to meaning-making, it is first necessary to clarify what we mean by “phenomenological description,” as it is described in Logical Investigations. Drawing upon the work of Brentano and Meinong, Husserl develops a set of necessary structural relations between the knower (ego), the objects of experience, and the horizon within which those objects are given. The relation is characterized in an axiomatic manner as intentionality, where the subjective consciousness and its objects are correlates brought together in a psychological act. Subjectivity contributes to and makes possible cognition; specifically, it must be the case that perception and cognition are always about something given in the stream of consciousness, they are only possible because consciousness intends or refers to these immanent objects. As we shall presently see, the intentional nature of consciousness applies to Ricoeur’s hermeneutics of the understanding, bestowing metaphor with a special ability to expand (to nearly undermining) the structure of reference in a non-literal sense to an existential state.

Husserl’s stage like development of phenomenology unveils the structure of intentionality as derived from the careful description of certain mental acts. Communicable linguistic expressions, such as names and sentences, exist only in so far as they exhibit intentional meanings for speakers. Written or spoken expressions only carry references to objects because they have meanings for speakers and knowers. If we examine all of our mental perceptions, we find it impossible to think without intending an object of some sort. Both Continental and Anglo-American thinkers agree that metaphor holds the key to understanding these processes, as it re-organizes our senses of perception, temporality, and relation of subject to object, referring to these as subjects of existential concern and possibility.

b. Heidegger’s Contribution

Heidegger, building upon the phenomenological thematic, asserts that philosophical analysis should keep to careful description of the human encounter with the world, revealing the modes in which being is existentially or relationally given. This signals both a nod to and departure from Husserl, leading to a rethinking of phenomenology which replaces the theoretical apprehension of meaning with an “uncovering” of being as it is lived out in experiential contexts or horizons. Later, Ricoeur will draw on Heidegger’s “existentialized” intentionality as he characterizes the referential power of metaphors to signal those meanings waiting to be “uncovered’ by Dasein’s (human as being-there) experience of itself – in relation to others, and to alternate worlds of possibility.

As his student, Heidegger owes to Husserl the phenomenological intent to capture “the things themselves” (die Sachen selbst), however, the Heideggerian project outlined in Being and Time rejects the attempt to establish phenomenology as a science of the structures of consciousness and reforms it in ontologically disclosive or manifestational terms. Heidegger’s strong attraction to the hermeneutic tradition in part originates in his dialogue with Wilhem Dilthey, the 19th century thinker who stressed the importance of historical consciousness attitude in guiding the work of the social sciences and hermeneutics, directed toward the understanding of primordial experience. Dilthey’s influence on Heidegger and Ricoeur (as well as Gadamer) is evident, in that all recognize the historical life of humans as apprehended in the study of the text (a form of spirit), particularly those containing metaphors and narratives conveying a lived, concrete experience of religious life.

Heidegger rejects the notion that the structures of consciousness are internally maintained as transcendentally subjective and also directed towards their transcendental object. Phenomenology must now be tied to the problems of human existence, and must then direct itself immediately towards the lived world and allow this “beholding” of the world to guide the work of “its own uncovering.”

Heidegger argues for a return to the original Greek definitions of the terms phainonmenon (derived from phainesthai, or “that which shows itself”) and logos. Heidegger adopts these terms for his own purposes, utilizing them to reinforce the dependence of ontological disclosure or presence: those beings showing themselves or letting themselves be “seen-as.” The pursuit of aletheia, (“truth as recovering of the forgotten aspects of being”) is now fulfilled through adherence to a method of self-interpretation achieved from the standpoint of Dasein’s (humanity’s) subjectivity, which has come to replace the transcendental ego of Kant and Husserl.

The turn to language, in this case, must be more than simple communication between persons; it is a primordial feature of subjectivity. Language is to be the interpretive medium of the understanding through which all forms of being present themselves to subjective apprehension. In this way, Heidegger replaces the transcendental version of phenomenology with the disclosive, where the structure of interpretation provides further insight into his ontological purposes of the understanding.

3. Existential Phenomenology: Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics, and Metaphor

The linguistic turn in phenomenology has been most directly applied to metaphor in the works of Paul Ricoeur, who revisits Husserlian and Heideggerian themes in his extensive treatment of metaphor. He extends his analysis of metaphor into a fully developed discursive theory of symbol, focusing on those found in religious texts and sacred narratives. His own views follow from what he thinks are overly limited structuralist theories of symbol, which, in essence, do not provide a theory of linguistic reference useful for his own hermeneutic project. For Ricoeur, a proper theory of metaphor understands it to be “a re-appropriation of our effort to exist,” echoing Nietszche’s call to go back to the primordiality of being. Metaphor must then include the notion that such language is expressive and constitutive of the being of those who embark on philosophical reflection.

Much of Ricoeur’s thought can be characterized by his well-known statement “the symbol gives rise to the thought.” Ricoeur shares Heidegger’s and Husserl’s assumptions: we reflectively apprehend or grasp the structures of human experience as they are presented to temporalized subjective consciousness While the “pure” phenomenology of Husserl seeks a transparent description of experience as it is lived out in phases or moments, Ricoeur, also following Nietzsche, centers the creation of meaning in the existential context. The noetic act originates in the encounter with a living text, constituting “a horizon of possibilities,” for the meaning of existence, thus abandoning the search for essences internal to the objects we experience in the world.

His foundational work in The Symbolism of Evil and The Rule of Metaphor places the route to human understanding concretely, via symbolic expressions which allow for the phenomenological constitution, reflection, and re-appropriation of experience. These processes are enabled by the structure of “seeing-as,” adding to Heidegger’s insight with the metaphoric acting as a “refiguring” of that which is given to consciousness. At various points he enters into conversation with Max Black and Nelson Goodman, among others, who also recognize the cognitive contributions to science and art found in the models and metaphors. In Ricoeur’s case, sacred metaphors display the same second-order functions shared by those in the arts and sciences, but with a distinctively ontological emphasis: “the interpretation of symbols is worthy of being called a hermeneutics only insofar as it is a part of self-understanding and of the understanding of being” (COI 30).

In The Rule of Metaphor, Ricoeur, departing from Aristotle, locates the signifying power of metaphor primarily at the level of the sentence, not individual terms. Metaphor is to be understood as a discursive linguistic act which achieves its purpose through extended predication rather than simple substitution of names. Ricoeur, like so many language philosophers, argues that Aristotelian substitution is incomplete; it does not go far enough in accounting for the semantic, syntactic, logical, and ontological issues that accompany the creation of a metaphor. The standard substitution model cannot do justice to potential for metaphor create meaning by working in tandem with propositional thought-structures (sentences). To these ends, Ricoeur’s study in The Rule of Metaphor replaces substitution and strict denotative theories with a theory of language that works through a structure of double reference.

Taking his lead while diverging from Aristotle, Ricoeur reads the metaphorical transfer of a name as a kind of “category mistake” which produces an imaginative construction about the new way objects may be related to one another. He expands this dynamic of “meaning transfer” on to the level of the sentence, then text, enabling the production of a second-order discursive level of thinking whereby all forms of symbolic language become phenomenological disclosures of being.

The discussion begins with the linguistic movement of epiphora (transfer of names-predicates) taken from an example in Poetics. A central dynamic exists in transposing one term, with one set of meaning-associations onto another. Citing Aristotle’s own example of “sowing around a god-created flame,”

If A = light of the sun, B = action of the sun, C = grain, and D = sowing, then

B is to A, as D is to C

We see action of the sun is to light as sowing is to grain, however, B is a vague action term (sun’s action) which is both missing and implied; Ricoeur calls this a “nameless act” which establishes a similar relation to the object, sunlight, as sowing is to the grain. In this act the phenomenological space for the creation of new meaning is opened up, precisely because we cannot find a conventional word to take the place of a metaphorical word. The nameless act implies that the transfer of an alien name entails more than a simple substitution of concepts, and is therefore said to be logically disruptive.

a. The Mechanics of Conceptual Blending

The “nameless act” entails a kind of “cognitive leap:’’ since there is no conventional term for B, the act does not involve substituting a decorative term in its place. Rather, a new meaning association has been created through the semantic gap between the objects. The absence of the original literal term, the “semantic void”, cannot be filled without the creation of a metaphor which signals the larger discursive context of the sentence and eventually, the text. If, as above, the transfer of predicates (the sowing of grain as casting of flames) challenges the “rules” of meaning dictated by ostensive theory, we are forced to make a new connection where there was none, between the conventional and metaphorical names for the object. For Ricoeur, the figurative (sowing around a flame) acts as hermeneutic medium in that it negates and displaces the original term, signifying a “new kind of object” which is in fact a new form (logos) of being. The metaphorical statement allows us to say that an object is and is not what we usually call it. The sense-based aspect is then “divorced” from predication and subsequently, logos is emptied of its objective meaning; the new object may be meaningful but not clear under the conditions of strict denotation or natural knowledge.

We take note that the “new object” (theoretically speaking) has more than figurative existence; the newly formed subject-predicate relation places the copula at the center of the name-object (ROM 18). Ricoeur’s objective is to create a dialectically driven process which produces a new ‘object-domain’ or category of being. Following the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung, (through the aforementioned negation and displacement) the new name has opened up a new field of meaning to be re-appropriated into our reflective consciousness. This is how Ricoeur deconstructs first-order reference in order to develop an ontology of sacred language based on second-order reference.

We are led to the view that myths are modes of discourse whose meanings are phenomenological spaces of openness, creating a nearly infinite range of interpretations. Thus we see how metaphor enables being, as Aristotle notes, to “be said in many ways.”

Ricoeur argues that second-order discursivity “violates” the pre-existing first order of genus and species, in turn causing a kind of upheaval among further relations and rules set by the categories: namely subordination, coordination, proportionality or equality among object properties. Something of a unity of being remains, yet for Ricoeur this non-generic unity or enchainement, corresponds to a single generic context referring to “Being,” restricting the senses or applications of transferred predicates in the metaphoric context.

b. The Role of Kant’s Schematism in Conceptual Blending

The notion of a “non-generic unity” raises, perhaps, more philosophical problems than it answers. How are we to explain the mechanics which blend descriptors from one object domain and its sets of perceptions, to a domain of foreign objects? Ricoeur addresses the epistemic issues surrounding the transfer of names from one category to another in spatiotemporal experience by importing Kant’s theory of object construction, found in the Critique of Pure Reason. In the “Transcendental Schematism”, Kant establishes the objective validity of the conceptual categories we use to synthesize the contents of experience. In this section, Kant elevates the Aristotelian categories from grammatical principles to formal structures intrinsic to reason. Here, he identifies an essential problem for knowledge: how are we to conceive a relationship between these pure concept-categories of the understanding and the sensible objects given to us in space and time? With the introduction of the schematism, Kant seeks a resolution to the various issues inherent to the construction of mental representations (a position shared by contemporary cognitive scientists; see below). For Ricoeur, this serves to answer the problem of how metaphoric representations of reality can actually “refer” to reality (even if only at the existential level of experience).

Kant states “the Schematism” is a “sensible condition under which alone pure concepts of the understanding can be employed” (CPR/A 136). Though the doctrine is sometimes said to be notoriously confusing due to its circular nature, the schemata are meant as a distinctive set of mediating representations, rules, or operators in the mind which themselves display the universal and necessary characteristics of sensible objects; these characteristics are in turn synthesized and unified by the activity of the transcendental imagination.

In plainer terms, the schematic function is used by the imagination to guide it in the construction of images. It does not seem to be any kind of picture of an object, but rather the “form” or “listing” of how we produce the picture. For Ricoeur, the schematism lends the structural support for assigning an actual truth-value or cognitive contribution to the semantic innovation produced by metaphor. The construction of new meaning via new forms of predication entails a re-organization and re-interpretation of pre-existing forms, and the operations of the productive imagination enable the entire process.

In the work Figuring the Sacred, for example, Ricoeur, answering to his contemporary Mircea Eliade ( The Sacred and The Profane), moves metaphor beyond the natural “boundedness” of myths and symbols. While these manifest meaning, they are still constrained in that they must mirror the natural cosmic order of things. Metaphor, on the other hand, occupies the center of a “hermeneutic of proclamation;” it has the power to proclaim because it is a “free invention of discourse.” Ricoeur specifically explicates biblical parables, proverbs, and eschatological statements as extended metaphorical processes. Thus, “The Kingdom of God will not come with signs that you can observe. Do not say, ‘It is here; it is there.’ Behold the kingdom of God is among you” (Luke 17:20-21). This saying creates meaning by breaking down our ordinary or familiar temporal frameworks applied to interpretation of signs (of the kingdom). The quest for signs is, according to Ricoeur, “overthrown” for the sake of “a completely new existential signification” (FS 59).

This discussion follows from the earlier work in The Rule of Metaphor, where the mechanics of representation behind this linguistic act of “re-description” are further developed. The act points us towards a novel ontological domain of human possibility, enabled through new cognitive content. The linguistic act of creating a metaphor in essence becomes a hermeneutic act directed towards a gap which must be bridged, that between the abstract (considerations of reflection) understanding (Verstehen) and the finite living out of life. In this way Ricoeur’s theory, often contrasted with that of Derrida, takes metaphor beyond the mechanics of substitution.

4. Jacques Derrida: Metaphor as Metaphysics

In general, Derrida's deconstructive philosophy can be read as a radically alternative way of reading philosophical texts and arguments, viewing them in a novel way through the lens of a rhetorical methodology. This will amount to the taking apart of established ways in which philosophers define perception, concept formation, meaning, and reference.

Derrida, from the outset, will call into question the assumption that the formation of concepts (logos) somehow escapes the primordiality of language and the fundamentally metaphorical-mythical nature of philosophical discourse. In a move which goes much further than Ricoeur, Derrida argues for what Guiseseppe Stellardi so aptly calls the “reverse metaphorization of concepts.” The reversal is such that there can be no final separation between the linguistic-metaphorical and the philosophical realms. These domains are co-constitutive of one another, in the sense that either one cannot be fully theorized or made to fully or transparently explain the meaning of the other. The result is that language acquires a certain obscurity, ascendancy, and autonomy. It will permanently elude our attempts to fix its meaning-making activity in foundational terms which necessitate a transcendent or externalized (to language) unified being.

Derrida's White Mythology offers a penetrating critique of the common paradigm involving the nature of concepts, posing the following questions: “Is there metaphor in the text of philosophy, and if so, how?” Here, the history of philosophy is characterized as an economy, a kind of "usury" where meaning and valuation are understood as metaphorical processes involving “gain and loss.” The process is represented through Derrida’s well-known image of the coin:

I was thinking how the Metaphysicians, when they make a language for themselves, are like … knife-grinders, who instead of knives and scissors, should put medals and coins to the grindstone to efface … the value… When they have worked away till nothing is visible in these crown pieces, neither King Edward, the Emperor William, nor the Republic, they say: 'These pieces have nothing either English, German, or French about them; we have freed them from all limits of time and space; they are not worth five shillings any more ; they are of inestimable value, and their exchange value is extended indefinitely.’ (WM 210).

The “usury” of the sign (the coin) signifies the passage from the physical to the metaphysical. Abstractions now become “worn out” metaphors; they seem like defaced coins, their original, finite values now replaced by a vague or rough idea of the meaning-images that may have been present in the originals.

Such is the movement which simultaneously creates and masks the construction of concepts. Concepts, whose real origins have been forgotten, now only yield an empty sort of philosophical promise – that of “the absolute”, the universalized, unlimited “surplus value” achieved by the eradication of the sensory or momentarily given. Derrida reads this process along a negative Hegelian line: the metaphysicians are most attracted to “concepts in the negative, ab-solute, in-finite, non-Being” (WM 121). That is, their love of the most abstract concept, made that way “by long and universal use”, reveals a preference for the construction of a metaphysics of Being. This is made possible via the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung. The German term refers to a dynamic of sublation where the dialectical, progressive movement of consciousness overcomes and subsumes the particular, concrete singularities of experience through successive moments of cognition. Derrida levels a strong criticism against Hegel’s attempts to overcome difference, arguing that consciousness as understood by Hegel takes on the quality of building an oppressive sort of narrative, subsuming the particular and the momentary under an artificial theoretical gaze. Derrida prefers giving theoretical privilege to the negative; that is, to the systematic negation of all finite determinations of meaning derived from particular aspects of particular beings.

Echoing Heidegger, Derrida conceives of metaphysical constructs as indicative of the Western "logocentric epoch" in philosophy. They depend for their existence on the machinery of binary logic. They remain static due to our adherence to the meaning of ousia (essence), the definition of being based on self-identitical substance, which can only be predicated or expressed in either/or terms. Reference to being, in this case, is constrained within the field of the proper and univocal. Both Heidegger and Derrida, and to some degree Ricoeur seek to free reference from these constraints. Unlike Heidegger, however, Derrida does not work from the assumption that being indicates some unified primordial reality.

For Derrida, there lies hidden within the merely apparent logical unity (with its attendant binary oppositions) or logocentricity of consciousness a white mythology, masking the primitive plurivocity of being which eludes all attempts to name it. Here we find traces of lost meanings, reminiscent of the lost inscriptions on coins. These are “philosophemes,” words, tropes or modes of figuration which do not express ideas or abstract representations of things (grounded in categories), but rather invoke a radically plurivocal notion of meaning. Having thus dismantled the logic of either/or with difference (difference), Derrida gives priority to ambiguity, in “both/and” and “neither/nor” modes of thought and expression. Meaning must then be constituted of and by difference, rather than identity, for difference subverts all preconceived theoretical or ontological structures. It is articulated in the context of all linguistic relations and involves ongoing displacement of a final idealized and unified form of meaning; such displacement reveals through hints and traces, the reality and experience of a disruptive alterity in meaning and being. Alterity is “always already there” by virtue of the presence of the Other.

With the introduction of “the white mythology,” Derrida’s alignment with Nietszche creates a strong opposition to traditional Western theoria. Forms of abstract ideation and theoretical systems representing the oppressive consciousness of the “white man,” built in the name of reason/logos, are in themselves a collection of analogies, existing as colorless dead metaphors whose primitive origins lie in the figurative realms of myths, symbol, and fable.

Derrida's project, resulting as it does in the deconstruction of metaphysics, runs counter to Ricoeur's tensive theory. In contrast to Heidegger’s restrained criticism Derrida’s deconstruction appears to Ricoeur “unbounded.” That is, Ricoeur still assumes a distinction between the speculative and the poetic, where the poetic “drives the speculative” to explicate a surplus of meaning. The surplus, or plurivocity is problematic from Derrida's standpoint. The latter argues that the theory remains logocentric in that it remains true to the binary mode of identity and difference which underlie metaphysical distinctions such as “being and non-being.” For Ricoeur, metaphors create a new space for meaning based on the tension between that which is (can be properly predicated of an object) and that which “is not” (which cannot be predicated of an object). Derrida begs to differ: in the final analysis, there can be no such separation, systematic philosophical theory or set of conceptual structures through which we subsume and “explain” the cognitive or existential value of metaphor.

Derrida's reverse metaphorization of concepts does not support a plurivocal characterization of meaning and being, it does not posit a wider referential field; for Derrida metaphors and concepts remain in a complex, always ambiguous relation to one another. Thus he seems to do away with “reference,” or the distinction between signifier and signified, moving even beyond polysemy (the many potential meaning that words carry). The point here is to preserve the flux of sense and the ongoing dissemination of meaning and otherness.

a. The Dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida

The dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida regarding the referential power of metaphor lies in where they position themselves with regard to Aristotle. Ricoeur's position, in giving priority to the noun-phrase instead of the singular name, challenges Aristotle while still appealing to the original taxonomy (categories) of being based on an architectonic system of predication. For Ricoeur, metaphoric signification mimics the fundamentally equivocal nature of being—we cannot escape the ontological implications of Aristotle’s statement: being can be “said in many ways.” Nevertheless, Ricoeur maintains the distinction between mythos and logos, for we need the tools provided by speculative discourse to explain the polysemic value of metaphors.

Derrida’s deconstruction reaches back to dismantle Aristotle's theory, rooted as it is in the ontology of the proper name/noun (onoma) which signifies a thing as self-identical being (homousion). This, states Derrida, “reassembles and reflects the culture of the West; the white man takes his own mythology, Indo-European mythology, his own logos, that is, the mythos of his idiom, for the universal form of that he must still wish to call Reason” (WM 213).

The original theory makes metaphor yet another link in the logocentric chain—a form of metaphysical oppression. If the value of metaphor is restricted to the transference of names, then metaphor entails a loss or negation of the literal which is still under the confines of a notion of discourse which upholds the traditional formulations of representation and reference in terms of the mimetic and the “proper” which are, in turn, based on a theory of perception (and an attendant metaphysics) that gives priority to resemblance, identity, or what we can call “the law of the same.”

5. Anglo-American Philosophy: Interactionist Theories

Contemporary phenomenological theories of metaphor directly challenge the straightforward theory of reference, replacing the ordinary propositional truth based on denotation with a theory of language which designates and discloses its referents. These interactionist theories carry certain Neo-Kantian features, particularly in the work of the analytic philosophers Nelson Goodman and Max Black. They posit the view that metaphors can reorganize the connections we make between our perceptions of the world. Their theories reflect certain phenomenological assumptions about the ways in which figurative language expands the referential field, allowing for the creation of novel meanings and creating new possibilities for constructing models of reality; in moving between the realms of art and science, metaphors have an interdisciplinary utility. Both Goodman and Black continue to challenge the traditional theory of linguistic reference, offering instead the argument that reference is enabled by the manipulation of predicates in figurative modes of thinking through language.


6. Metaphor, Phenomenology, and Cognitive Science

Recent studies underscore the connections between metaphors, mapping, and schematizing aspects of cognitive organization in mental life. Husserl’s approach to cognition took an anti-naturalist stance, opposed to defining consciousness as an objective entity and therefore unsuited to studying the workings of subjective consciousness; instead his phenomenological stance gave priority to subjectivity, since it constitutes the necessary set of pre-conditions for knowing anything at all as an object or a meaning. Recently, the trend has been renewed and phenomenology has made some productive inroads into the examination of connectionist and embodied approaches to perception, cognition and other sorts of dynamic and adaptive (biological) systems.

Zahavi and Thompson, for example, see strong links between Husserlian phenomenology and philosophy of mind with respect to the phenomena of consciousness, where the constitutive nature of subjective consciousness is clarified specifically in terms of the forms and relations of different kinds of intentional mental states. These involve the unity of temporal experience, the structural relations between intentional mental acts and their objects, and the inherently embodied nature of cognition. Those who study the embodied mind do not all operate in agreement with traditional phenomenological assumptions and methods. Nevertheless, some “naturalized” versions in the field of consciousness studies are now gaining ground, offering viable solutions to the kind of problematic Cartesian dualistic metaphysics that Husserl’s phenomenology suggests.

a. The Embodied Mind

In recent years, the expanding field of cognitive science has explored the role of metaphor in the formation of consciousness (cognition and perception). In a general sense, it appears that contemporary cognitivist, constructivist, and systems (as in self-organizing) approaches to the study of mind incorporate metaphor as a tool for developing an anti-metaphysical, anti-positivist theory of mind, in an attempt to reject any residual Cartesian and Kantian psychologies. The cognitive theories, however, remain partially in debt to Kantian schematism and its role in cognition.

There is furthermore in these theories an overturning of any remaining structuralist suppositions (that language and meaning might be based on autonomous configurations of syntactic elements). Many cognitive scientists, in disagreement with Chomsky’s generative grammar, study meaning as a form of cognition that is activated in context of use. Lakoff and Johnson, in Philosophy in the Flesh, find a great deal of empirical evidence for the ways in which metaphors shape our ordinary experience, exploring the largely unconscious perceptual and linguistic processes that allow us to understand one idea or domain of experience, both conceptual and physical, in terms of a “foreign” domain. The research follows the work of Srini Narayanan and Eleanor Rosch, cognitive scientists who also examine schemas and metaphors as key in embodied theories of cognition. Such theories generally trace the connective interplay between our neuronal makeup, or physical interactions with the environment, and our own private and social human purposes.

In a limited sense, the stress on the embodied nature of cognition aligns itself with the phenomenological position. Perceptual systems, built in physical response to determinate spatio-temporal and linguistic contexts, become phenomenological “spaces” shaped through language use. Yet these researchers largely take issue with Continental phenomenology and traditional philosophy in a dramatic and far-reaching way, objecting to the claim that the phenomenological method of introspection makes adequate space for our ability to survey and describe all available fields of consciousness in the observing subject. If it is the case that we do not fully access the far reaches of hidden cognitive processes, much of the metaphorical mapping which underlies cognition takes place at an unconscious level, which is sometimes referred to as “the cognitive unconscious.”(PIF 12-15)

Other philosophers of mind, including Stefano Arduini, and Antonio D’Amasio, work along similar lines in cognitive linguistics, cognitive science, neuroscience, and artificial intelligence. Their work investigates the ways in which metaphors ground various first and second-order cognitive and emotional operations and functions. Their conclusions share insights with the Continental studies conceiving of metaphor as a “refiguring” of experience. There is then some potential for overlap with this cognitive-conceptual version of metaphor, where metaphors and schemata embody emergent transformative categories enabling the creation of new fields of cognition and meaning.

Arduini, in his work, has explored what he calls the “anthropological ability” to build up representations of the world. Here rhetorical figures are realized on the basis of conceptual domains which create the borders of experience. We have access to a kind of reality that would otherwise be indeterminate, for human beings have the ability to conceptualize the world in imaginative terms through myth, symbol, the unconscious, or any expressive sign. For Arduini, figurative activity does not depict the given world, but allows for the ability to construct world images employed in reality. To be figuratively competent is to use the imagination as a tool which puts patterns together in inventive mental processes. Arduini then seems to recall Nieztsche; anthropologically speaking, humans are always engaging in some form of figuration or form of language, which allows for “cognitive competence” in that it chooses among particular forms which serve to define the surrounding contexts or environments. Again, metaphor is foundational to the apprehension of reality; it is part of the pre-reflective or primordial apparatus of experience, perception, and first- through second-order thought, comprising an entire theoretical approach as well as disciplines such as evolutionary anthropology (see Tooby and Cosmides).

b. The Literary Mind

The work of Gilles Fauconnier and Mark Turner extends that of Lakoff and Johnson outlined above. For Fauconnier, the task of language is to construct, and for the linguist and cognitive scientist it is “a window into the mind.” Independently and together, Fauconnier and Turner’s collaboration results in a theory of conceptual blending in which metaphorical forms take center stage. Basically, the theory of conceptual blending follows from Lakoff and Johnson’s work on the “mapping” or projective qualities of our cognitive faculties. For example, if we return to take Shakespearean line “in me thou seest the glowing of such fire”, the source is fire, whose sets of associations are projected onto the target – in this case the waning aspect of the narrator. Their research shows that large numbers of such cross-domain mappings are expressed as conceptual structures which have propositional content: for example, “life is fire, loss is extinction of fire.” There exist several categories of mappings across different conceptual domains, including spatio-temporal orientation, movement, and containment. For example: “time flies” or “this relationship is smothering.”

Turner’s work in The Literary Mind, takes a slightly different route, portraying these cognitive mechanisms as forms of “storytelling.” This may, superficially, seem counterintuitive to the ordinary observer, but Turner gives ample evidence for the mind’s ability to do much of its everyday work using various forms of narrative projection (LM 6-9). It is not too far a reach from this version of narrative connection back to the hermeneutic and cognitive-conceptual uses of metaphor outlined earlier. If we understand parables to be essentially forms of extended metaphor, we can clearly see the various ways in which they contribute to the making of intelligible experience.

The study of these mental models sheds light on the phenomenological and hermeneutic aspects of reality-construction. If these heuristic models are necessary to cognitive functioning, it is because they allow us to represent higher-order aspects of reality which involve expressions of human agency, intentionality, and motivation. Though we may be largely unaware of these patterns, they are based on our ability to think in metaphor, are necessary, and are continuously working to enable the structuring of intentional experience – which cannot always be adequately represented by straightforward first-order physical description. Fauconnier states:

We see their status as inventions by contrasting them with alternative representations of the world. When we watch someone sitting down in a chair, we see what physics cannot recognize: an animate agent performing an intentional act. (MTL 19-20)

Turner, along with Fauconnier and Lakoff, connects parabolic thought with the image-schematic or mapping between different domains of encounter with our environments. Fauconnier’s work, correlating here with Turner’s, moves between cognitive-scientific and phenomenological considerations; both depict mapping as a constrained form of projection, a complex mental manipulation which moves across mental structures which correspond to various phenomenological spaces of thought, action, and communication.

Metaphorical mapping allows the mind to cross and conflate several domains of experience. The cross-referencing, reminiscent of Black’s interactionist dynamics, amounts to a form of induction resulting from projected relations between a source structure, a pattern we already understand, onto a target structure, that which we seek to understand.

Mapping as a form of metaphoric construction leads to other forms of blending, conceptual integration, and novel category formation. We can, along with Fauconnier and the rest, describe this emergent evolution of linguistic meaning in dialectical terms, arguing that it is possible to mesh together two images of virus (biological and computational) into a third integrated idea that integrates and expands the meaning of the first two (MTL 22). Philosophically speaking, we seem to have come full circle back to the Hegelian theme which runs through the phenomenological analysis of metaphor as a re-mapping of mind and reality.

7. Conclusion

The Continental theories of metaphor that have extrapolated and developed variations on the theme expressed in Nietzsche’s apocryphal pronouncement that truth is “a mobile army of metaphors.” The notion that metaphorical language is somehow ontologically and epistemologically prior to ordinary propositional language has since been voiced by Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida. For these thinkers metaphor serves as a foundational heuristic structure, one which is primarily designed to subvert ordinary reference and in some way dismantle the truth-bearing claims of first-order propositional language. Martin Heidegger’s existential phenomenology does away with the assumption that true or meaningful intentional statements reflect epistemic judgments about the world; that is, they do not derive referential efficacy through the assumed correspondence between an internal idea and an external object. While there may be a kind of agreement between our notions of things and the world in which we find those things, it is still a derivative agreement emerging from a deeper ontologically determined set of relations between things-in-the-world, given or presented to us as inherently linked together in particular historical, linguistic, or cultural contexts.

The role of metaphor in perception and cognition also dominates the work of contemporary cognitive scientists, linguists, and those working in the related fields of evolutionary anthropology and computational theory. While the latter may not be directly associated with Continental phenomenology, aspects of their work support an “anti-metaphysical” position and draw upon common phenomenological themes which stress the embodied, linguistic, contextual, and symbolic nature of knowledge. Thinkers and researchers in this camp argue that metaphoric schemas are integral to human reasoning and action, in that they allow us to develop our cognitive and heuristic capacities beyond simple and direct first order experience.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Categories and De Interpretatione. J.C. Ackrill, trans. Oxford, Clarendon, 1963. (CDI)
  • Aristotle. Peri Hermenenias. Hans Arens, trans. Philadelphia, Benjamins, 1984. (PH)
  • Arduini, Stefano (ed.). Metaphors. Edizioni Di Storia E Letteratura,
  • Barber, A. and Stainton, R. The Concise Encyclopedia of Language and Linguistics.
  • Oxford, Elsevier Ltd., 2010
  • Black, Max. Models and Metaphors. Ithaca, Cornell, 1962. (MAM)
  • Brentano, Franz C. On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle. Berkeley, UC Press, 1975.
  • Cazeaux, Clive. Metaphor and Continental Philosophy, from Kant to Derrida. London, Routledge, 2007.
  • Cooper, David E. Metaphor. London, Oxford, 1986.
  • Derrida, Jacques. “White Mythology, Metaphor in the Text of Philosophy” in Margins of Philosophy, trans. A. Bass, Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 1982. (WM)
  • Fauconnier, Gilles. Mappings in Thought and Language. Cambridge, Cambridge University, 1997. (MTL)
  • Gallagher, Shaun. Phenomenology and Non-reductionist Cognitive Science” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science. ed. by Shaun Gallagher and Daniel Schmicking. Springer, New York, 2010.
  • Goodman, Nelson. Languages of Art. New York, Bobs-Merrill, 1968.
  • Hinman, Lawrence. “Nietzsche, Metaphor, and Truth” in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 43, #2, 1984.
  • Harnad, Stevan. “Category Induction and Representation” in Categorical Perception: The Groundwork of Cognition. New York, Cambridge, 1987.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. John MacQuarrie and E. Robinson, trans. New York,
  • Harper and Row, 1962. (BT)
  • Heidegger, Martin. The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, trans. A. Hofstadter, Bloomington, Indiana University Press, 1982.
  • Huemer, Wolfgang. The Constitution of Consciousness: A Study in Analytic Phenomenology. Routledge, 2005.
  • Johnson, Mark. “Metaphor and Cognition” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science, ed. by Shaun Gallagher and Daniel Schmicking. Springer, New York, 2010.
  • Joy, Morny. “Derrida and Ricoeur: A Case of Mistaken Identity” in The Journal of Religion. Vol. 68, #04, University of Chicago Press, 1988.
  • Kant, Immanuel. The Critique of Pure Reason. Trans. N. K. Smith, New York, 1958. (CPR)
  • Kofman, Sarah, Nietzsche and Metaphor. Trans. D. Large, Stanford, 1993.
  • Lakoff, George and Johnson, Mark. Philosophy in the Flesh: The Embodied Mind and Its Challenge to Western Thought. New York, Perseus-Basic, 1999.
  • Malabou, Catharine. The Future of Hegel: Plasticity, Temporality, and the Dialectic. Trans. Lisabeth During, New York, Routledge, 2005.
  • Nietzsche, F. The Birth of Tragedy and the Case of Wagner. Trans. W. Kaufman. New York, Vintage, 1967. (BOT)
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Imagination and Chance: The Difference Between the Thought of Ricoeur and Derrida. Albany, SUNY Press, 1992
  • Mohanty, J.N. and McKenna, W.R. Husserl’s Phenomenology; A Textbook. Washington, DC, University Press, 1989.
  • Rajan, Tilottama. Deconstruction and the Remainders of Phenomenology: Sartre, Derrida, Foucault, Baudrillard. Stanford, Stanford University Press, 2002.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. Figuring the Sacred, trans. D. Pellauer, Minneapolis, Fortress, 1995. (FS)
  • Ricoeur, Paul. The Rule of Metaphor. Toronto, University of Toronto, 1993. (ROM)
  • Schrift Alan D. and Lawlor, Leonard (eds.) TheHistory of Continental Philosophy; Vol. 4 Phenomenology: Responses and Developments. Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 2010.
  • Stellardi, Giuseppe. Heidegger and Derrida on Philosophy and Metaphor: Imperfect Thought. New York, Humanity-Prometheus, 2000.
  • Tooby, J. and L. Cosmides (ed. with J.Barkow). The Adapted Mind: Evolutionary Psychology and The Generation of Culture. Oxford, 1992.
  • Turner, Mark. The Literary Mind: The Origins of Thought and Language. Oxford, 1996. (LM)
  • Woodruff-Smith, David and McIntyre, Ronald. Husserl and Intentionality: A Study of Mind, Meaning, and Language. Boston, 1982.
  • Zahavi, Dan. “Naturalized Phenomenology” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science.


Author Information

S. Theodorou
Immaculata University
U. S. A.

Mou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) (1909—1995)

Mou ZongsanMou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) is a sophisticated and systematic example of a modern Chinese philosopher. A Chinese nationalist, he aimed to reinvigorate traditional Chinese philosophy through an encounter with Western (and especially German) philosophy and to restore it to a position of prestige in the world. In particular, he engaged closely with Immanuel Kant’s three Critiques and attempted to show, pace Kant, that human beings possess intellectual intuition, a supra-sensible mode of knowledge that Kant reserved to God alone. He assimilated this notion of intellectual intuition to ideas found in Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism and attempted to expand it into a metaphysical system that would establish the objectivity of moral values and the possibility of sagehood.

Mou’s Collected Works run to thirty-three volumes and extend to history of philosophy, logic, epistemology, ontology, metaethics, philosophy of history, and political philosophy.  His corpus is an unusual hybrid in that although its main aim is to erect a metaphysical system, many of the books where Mou pursues that end consist largely of cultural criticism or histories of Confucian, Buddhist, or Daoist philosophy in which Mou explains his own opinions through exegesis of other thinkers’ in a terminology appropriated from Kant, Tiantai Buddhism, and Neo-Confucianism.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Cultural Thought
    1. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation
    2. Development of Chinese Philosophy
    3. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism
  3. Metaphysical Thought
    1. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves
    2. Two-Level Ontology
    3. Perfect Teaching
  4. Criticisms
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Mou was born in 1909, at the very end of China’s imperial era, into the family of a rural innkeeper who admired Chinese classical learning, which the young Mou came to share. At just that time, however, traditional Chinese learning was being denigrated by some of the intellectual elite, who searched frantically for something to replace it due to fears that their own tradition was dangerously impotent against modern nation-states armed with Western science, technology, bureaucracy, and finance.

In 1929, Mou enrolled in Peking (Beijing) University’s department of philosophy. He embarked on a deep study of Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica (then a subject of great interest in Chinese philosophical circles ) and also of Whitehead’s Process and Reality. However, Mou was also led by his interest in Whiteheadian process thought to read voraciously in the pre-modern literature on the Yijing (I Ching or Book of Changes), and his classical tastes made him an oddball at Peking University, which was vigorously modernist and anti-traditional.  Mou would have been a lonely figure there had he not met Xiong Shili in his junior year. Xiong was just making his name as a nationally known apologist for traditional Chinese philosophy and mentored Mou for years afterward.   The two men remained close until Mou later left the mainland. Mou graduated from Peking University in 1933 and moved around the country unhappily from one short-term teaching job to another owing to frequent workplace personality conflicts and fighting between the Chinese government and both Japanese and Communist forces. Despite these peregrinations, Mou wrote copiously on logic and epistemology and also on the Yijing.  Mou hated the Communists very boisterously and when they took over China in 1949 he moved to Taiwan and spent the next decade teaching and writing in a philosophical vein about the history and future of Chinese political thought and culture. In 1960, once again unhappy with his colleagues, Mou was invited by his friend Tang Junyi, also a student of Xiong, to leave Taiwan for academic employment in Hong Kong.  There, Mou’s work took a decisive turn and entered what he later considered its mature stage, yielding the books which established him as a key figure in modern Chinese philosophy. During the next thirty-five years he published seven major monographs (one running to three volumes), together with translations of all three of Immanuel Kant’s Critiques and many more volumes’ worth of articles, lectures, and occasional writings. Mou officially retired from the Chinese University of Hong Kong in 1974 but continued to teach and lecture in Hong Kong and Taiwan until his death in 1995.

We can divide Mou’s expansive thought into two closely related parts which we might call his “cultural” thought, about the history and destiny of Chinese culture, and his “metaphysical” thought, concerning the problems and doctrines of Chinese philosophy, which Mou thought of as the essence of Chinese culture.

2. Cultural Thought

a. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation

Like most intellectuals of his generation, Mou was a nationalist and saw his work as a way to strengthen the Chinese nation and return it to a place of greatness in the world.

Influenced by Hegel, Mou thought of the history and culture of the Chinese nation as an organic whole,, with a natural and knowable course of development. He thought that China’s political destiny depended ultimately on its philosophy, and in turn blamed China’s conquest by the Manchus in 1644, and again by the Communists in 1949, on its loss of focus on the Neo-Confucianism of the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644)He hoped his own work would help to re-kindle China’s commitment to Confucianism and thereby help defeat Communism.

Along with many of his contemporaries, Mou was interested in why China never gave rise its own Scientific Revolution like that in the West, and also in articulating what the strengths were in China’s intellectual history whereby it outstripped the West. Mou phrased his answer to these two questions in terms of “inner sagehood” (neisheng) and “outer kingship” (waiwang). By “inner sagehood,” Mou meant the cultivation of moral conduct and outlook—at which he thought Confucianism was unequalled in the world—and he used “outer kingship” to encompass political governancealong with other ingredients in the welfare of society, such as a productive economy and scientific and technological know-how. Mou thought that China’s classical tradition was historically weak in the theory and practice of “outer kingship,” and he believed that Chinese culture would have to transform itself thoroughly by discovering in its indigenous learning the resources with which to develop traditions of science and democracy.

For the last thirty years of his life, all of Mou’s writings were part of a conversation with Immanuel Kant, whom he considered the greatest Western philosopher and the one most useful for exploring Confucian “moral metaphysics.” Throughout that half of his career, Mou’s books quoted Kant extensively (sometimes for pages at a time) and appropriated Kantian terms into the service of his reconstructed Confucianism. Scholars agree widely that Mou altered the meanings of these terms significantly when he moved them from Kant’s system into his own, but opinions vary about just how conscious Mou was that he had done so.

b. Development of Chinese Philosophy

As an apologist for Chinese philosophy, Mou was anxious to show that its genius extended to almost all areas and epochs of Chinese philosophy. To this end, He wrote extensively about the history of Chinese philosophy and highlighted the important contributions of Daoist and Buddhist philosophy, along with their harmonious interaction with Confucian philosophy in the dialectical unfolding and refinement of Chinese philosophy in each age.

Before China was united under the Qin dynasty (221-206 BCE), Mou believed, Chinese culture gave definitive form to the ancient philosophical inheritance of the late Zhou dynasty (771-221 BCE), culminating in the teachings of Confucius and Mencius. These were still epigrammatic rather systematic, but Mou thought that they already contained the essence of later Chinese philosophy in germinal form. The next great phase of development came in the Wei-Jin period (265-420 CE) with the assimilation of “Neo-Daoism” or xuanxue (literally “dark” or “mysterious learning”), from whence came the first formal articulation of the “perfect teaching” (concerning which see below). Shortly afterward, Mou taught, Chinese culture experienced its first great challenge from abroad, in the form of Buddhist philosophy. In the Sui and Tang dynasties (589-907) it was the task of Chinese philosophy to “digest” or absorb Buddhist philosophy into itself. In the process, it gave birth to indigenous Chinese schools of Buddhist philosophy (most notably Huayan and Tiantai), which Mou believed advanced beyond the Indian schools because they agreed with essential tenets of native Chinese philosophy, such as the teaching that all people are endowed with an innately sagely nature.

On Mou’s account, in the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644) Confucianism underwent a second great phase of development and reasserted itself as the true and proper leader of Chinese culture and philosophy. However, at the end of the Ming, there occurred what Mou taught was an alien irruption into Chinese history by the Manchus, who thwarted the “natural” course of China’s cultural unfolding. In the thinking of late Ming philosophers such as Huang Zongxi (1610-1695), Gu Yanwu (1613-1682), and Wang Fuzhi (1619-1692), Mou thought that China had been poised to give rise to its own new forms of “outer kingship” which would have eventuated in an indigenous birth of science and democracy in China, enabling China to compete with the modern West. Chinese culture, however. was diverted from that healthy course of development by the intrusion of the Manchus. Mou believed that it was this diversion which made China vulnerable to the Communist takeover of the 20th century by alienating it from its own philosophical tradition.

Mou preached that the mission of modern Chinese philosophy was to achieve a mutually beneficial conciliation with Western philosophy. Inspired by the West’s example, China would appropriate science and democracy into its native tradition, and the West in turn would benefit from China’s unparalleled expertise in “inner sagehood,” typified especially by its “perfect teaching.”

However, throughout Mou’s lifetime, he remained unimpressed with the actual state of contemporary Chinese philosophy. He seldom rated any contemporary Chinese thinkers as worthy of the name “philosopher,” and he mentioned Chinese Marxist thought only rarely and only as a force entirely antipathetic to true Chinese philosophy.

c. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism

In his historical writings on Confucianism, Mou is most famous for his thesis of the “three lineages” (san xi). Whereas Neo-Confucians where traditionally grouped into a “School of Principle” represented chiefly by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and a “School of Mind” associated with Lu Xiangshan (1139-1192) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529), Mou also recognized a third lineage exemplified by lesser-known figures as Hu Hong (Hu Wufeng) (1105-1161) and Liu Jishan (Liu Zongzhou) (1578-1645).

Mou judged this third lineage to be the true representatives of Confucian orthodoxy. He criticized Zhu Xi, conventionally regarded as the authoritative synthesizer of Neo-Confucian doctrine, as a usurper who despite good intentions depicted heavenly principle (tianli) in an excessively transcendent way that was foreign to the ancient Confucian message. On Mou’s view, that message is one of paradoxical “immanent transcendence” (neizai chaoyue), in which heavenly principle and human nature are only lexically distinct from each other, not substantially separate. It was because Mou believed that the Hu-Liu lineage of Neo-Confucianism expressed this paradoxical relationship most accurately and artfully that that he ranked it the highest or “perfect” (yuan) expression of Confucian philosophy. (See “Perfect Teaching” below.)

Because Mou wanted to revalorize the whole Chinese philosophical tradition, and not just its Confucian wing, he also wrote extensively on Chinese Buddhist philosophy. He maintained that Indian Buddhist philosophy had remained limited and flawed until in migrated to Chinawhere it was leavened with what Mou saw as core principles of indigenous Chinese philosophy, such as a belief in the basic goodness of both human nature and the world. From Chinese Buddhist thought he adopted methodological ideas that he later applied to his own system. One of these was “doctrinal classification” (panjiao), a doxographic technique of reading competing philosophical systems as forming a dialectical progression of closer and closer approximations to a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao), rather than as mutually incompatible contenders. Much as Mou discovered what he thought of as the highest expression of Confucian doctrine in the largely forgotten thinkers of the Hu-Liu lineage, he found what he thought of as their formal analog and philosophical precursor in the relatively obscure Tiantai school of Buddhism and its thesis of the identity of enlightenment and delusion.

Mou wrote far less about Daoism than Confucianism or Buddhism, but at least in principle he regarded it too as an indispensible part of the Chinese philosophical heritage. Mou focused most on the “Inner Chapters” (neipian) of the Zhuangzi, especially the “Wandering Beyond” (Xiaoyao you) and “Discussion on Smoothing Things Out”(Qi wu lun) and the writings of Wei-Jin commentators Guo Xiang (c. 252-312 CE) and Wang Bi (226-249 CE). Mou saw the Wei-Jin idea of “root and traces” (ji ben) in particular as an early forerunner of Tiantai Buddhist thinking central to its concept of the “perfect teaching.”

3. Metaphysical Thought

In his metaphysical writings, Mou was mainly interested in how moral value is able to exist and how people are able to know it. Mou hoped to show that humans can directly know moral value and indeed that such knowledge amounts to knowledge par excellence. In an inversion of one of Kant’s terms, he called this project “moral metaphysics” (daode de xingshangxue), meaning a metaphysics in which moral value is ontically primary. That is, a moral metaphysics considers that the central ontological fact is that moral value exists and is known or “intuited” by us more directly than anything else. Mou believed that Chinese philosophy alone has generated the necessary insights for constructing such a moral metaphysics, whereas Kant (who represented for Mou the summit of Western philosophy) did not understand moral knowing because, fixated on theoretical and speculative knowledge, he wrong-headedly applied the same transcendentalism that Mou found so masterful in the Critique of Pure Reason (which supposes that we know a thing not directly but only through the distorting lenses of our mental apparatus) to moral matters, where it is completely out of place.

a. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves

For many, the most striking thing about Mou’s philosophy (and the hardest to accept) is his conviction that human beings possess “intellectual intuition” (zhi de zhijue), a direct knowledge of reality without resort to the senses and without overlaying such sensory forms and cognitive categories as time, space, number, and cause and effect.

As with most of the terms that Mou borrowed from Kant, he attached a much different meaning to ‘intellectual intuition.’   For Kant, intellectual intuition was a capacity belonging to God alone. However, Mou thought this was Kant’s greatest mistake and concluded that one of the great contributions of Chinese philosophy to the world was a unanimous belief that humans have intellectual intuition. In the context of Chinese philosophy he took ‘intellectual intuition’ as an umbrella term for the various Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist concepts of a supra-mundane sort of knowing that, when perfected, makes its possessor a sage or a buddha.

On Mou’s analysis, though Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist philosophers call intellectual intuition by different names and theorize it differently, they agree that it is available to everyone, that it transcends subject-object duality, and that it is higher than, and prior to, the dualistic knowledge which comes through the “sensible intuition” of seeing and hearingoften called “empirical” (jingyan) or “grasping” (zhi) knowledge in Mou’s terminology. However, Mou taught that the Confucian understanding of intellectual intuition (referred to by a variety of names such as ren, “benevolence,” or liangzhi, “innate moral knowing”) is superior to the Buddhist and Daoist conceptions because it recognizes that intellectual intuition is essentially moral and creative.

Mou thought that people regularly manifest intellectual intuition in everyday life in the form of morally correct impulses and behaviors. To use the classic Mencian example, if we see a child about to fall down a well, we immediately feel alarm. For Mou, this sudden upsurge of concern is an occurrence of intellectual intuition, spontaneous and uncaused. Furthermore, Mou endorsed what he saw as the Confucian doctrine that it is this essentially moral intellectual intuition that “creates” or “gives birth to the ten thousand things” (chuangsheng wanwu) by conferring on them moral value.

b. Two-Level Ontology

Through our capacity for intellectual intuition, Mou taught, human beings are “finite yet infinite” (youxian er wuxian). He accepted Kant’s system as a good analysis of our finite aspect, which is to say our experience as beings who are limited in space and time and also in understanding, but he also thought that in our exercise of intellectual intuition we transcend our finitude as well.

Accordingly, Mou went to great pains to explain how the world of sensible objects and the realm of noumenal objects, or objects of intellectual intuition, are related to each other in a “two-level ontology” (liangceng cunyoulun) inspired by the Chinese Buddhist text The Awakening of Faith. In this model, all of reality is said to consist of mind, but a mind which has two aspects (yixin ermen). As intellectual intuition, mind directly knows things-in-themselves, without mediation by forms and categories and without the illusion that things-in-themselves are truly separate from mind. This upper level of the two-level ontology is what Mou labels “ontology without grasping” (wuzhi cunyoulun), once again choosing a term of Buddhist inspiration. However, mind also submits itself to forms and categories in a process that Mou calls “self-negation” (ziwo kanxian). Mind at this lower level, which Mou terms the “cognitive mind” (renzhi xin), employs sensory intuition and associated cognitive processes to apprehend things as discrete objects, separate from each other and from mindhaving location in time and space, numerical identity, and causal and other relations. This lower ontological level is what Mou calls “ontology with grasping” (zhi de cunyoulun).

c. Perfect Teaching

On Mou’s view, all of the many types of Chinese philosophy he studied taught some version of this doctrine of intellectual intuition, things-in-themselves, and phenomena, and he considered it important to explain how he adjudicated among these many broadly similar strains of philosophy. To that end, he borrowed from Chinese Buddhist scholasticism the concept of a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao) and the practice of classifying teachings (panjiao) doxographically in order to rank them from less to more “perfect” or complete.

A perfect teaching, in Mou’s sense of the term, is distinguished from a penultimate one not by its content (which is the same in either case) but by its rhetorical form. Specifically, a perfect teaching is couched in the form of a paradox (guijue). In Mou’s opinion, all good examples of Chinese philosophy acknowledge the commonsense difference between subject and object but also teach that we can transcend that difference through the exercise of intellectual intuition. But what distinguishes a perfect teaching is that it makes a show of flatly asserting, in a way supposed to surprise the listener, that subject and object are simply identical to one another, without qualification.

Mou developed this formal concept of a perfect teaching from the example offered by Tiantai Buddhist philosophyHe then applied it to the history of Confucian thoughtidentifying what he thought of as a Confucian equivalent to the Tiantai perfect teaching in the writings of Cheng Hao (1032-1085), Hu Hong, and Liu Jishan. Though Mou believed that all three families of Confucian philosophy—Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist—had their own versions of a perfect teaching, he rated the Confucian perfect teaching more highly than the Buddhist or Daoist ones, for it gives an account of the “morally creative” character of intellectual intuition, which he thought essential. In the Confucian perfect teaching, he taught, intellectual intuition is said to “morally create” the cosmos in the sense that it gives order to chaos by making moral judgments and thereby endowing everything in existence with moral significance.

Mou claimed that the perfect teaching was a unique feature of Chinese philosophy and reckoned this a valuable contribution to world philosophy because, in his opinion, only a perfect teaching supplied an answer to what he called the problem of the “summum bonum” (yuanshan) or “coincidence of virtue and happiness” (defu yizhi), that is, the problem of how it can be assured that a person of virtue will necessarily be rewarded with happiness. He noted that in Kant’s philosophy (and, in his opinion, throughout the rest of Western philosophy too) there could be no such assurance that virtue would be crowned with happiness except to hope that God would make it so in the afterlife. By contrast, Mou was proud to say, Chinese philosophy provides for this “coincidence of virtue and happiness” without having to posit either a God or an afterlife. The argument for that assurance differed in Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist versions of the perfect teaching, but in each case it consisted of a doctrine that intellectual intuition (equivalent to “virtue”) necessarily entails the existence of the phenomenal world (which Mou construed as the meaning of “happiness”), without being contingent on God’s intervention in this world or the next or on any condition other than the operation of intellectual intuition, which Mou considered available to all people at all times.

In arguing for the historical absence of such a solution to the problem of the perfect good anywhere outside of China, Mou did acknowledge that Epicurean and Stoic philosophers also tried to establish that virtue resulted in happiness, but he claimed that their explanations only worked by redefining either virtue or happiness in order to reduce its meaning to something analytically entailed by the other. However, some critics have argued that Mou’s alternative commits the same fault by effectively collapsing happiness into virtue.

4. Criticisms

Mou has often been accused of irrationalism due to his doctrine of the direct, supra-sensory intellectual intuition, which states that people can apprehend the deeper reality underlying the mere phenomena that are measured and described by scientific knowledge. Mou has also been ridiculed because he did not so much present positive arguments in favor of his main metaphysical beliefs as propound them as definitive facts, presumably known to him through a privileged access to sagely intuition.

Critics also frequently question the relevance of Mou’s philosophy, both to the Confucian tradition from which he took his inspiration, as well as to Chinese society. They point out that Mou’s thought (as well as that of other inheritors of Xiong Shili’s legacy in general) inhabits a far different social context than the Confucian tradition with which he identifies. With Mou and his generation, Chinese philosophy was detached from its old homes in the traditional schools of classical learning (shuyuan), the Imperial civil service, and monasteries and hermitages, and was transplanted into the new setting of the modern university, with its disciplinary divisions and limited social role. Critics point to this academicization as evidence that, despite Mou’s aspirations to kindle a massive revival of the Confucian spirit in China, his thought risks being little more than a “lost soul,” deracinated and intellectualized. The first problem with this, they claim, is that Mou reduces Confucianism to a philosophy in the modern academic sense and leaves out other important aspects of the pre-modern Confucian cultural system, such as its art, literature, and ritual and its political and career institutions. Second, they claim, because Mou’s brand of Confucianism accents metaphysics so heavily, it remains confined to departments of philosophy and powerless to exert any real influence over Chinese society.

Mou has also been criticized for his explicit essentialism. In keeping with his Hegelian tendency, he presented China as consisting essentially of Chinese culture, and even more particularly with Chinese philosophy, and he claimed in turn that this is epitomized by Confucian philosophy.  Furthermore, he presents the Confucian tradition as consisting essentially of an idiosyncratic-looking list of Confucian thinkers. Opponents complain that even if there were good reasons for Mou to enshrine his handful of favorite Confucians as the very embodiment of all of Chinese culture, this would remain Mou’s opinion and nothing more, a mere interpretation rather than the objective, factual historical insight that Mou claimed it was.

5. Influence

In Mou’s last decades, he began to be recognized together with other prominent students of Xiong Shili as a leader of what came to be called the “New Confucian” (dangdai xin rujia) movement, which aspires to revive and modernize Confucianism as a living spiritual tradition. Through his many influential protégés, Mou achieved great influence over the agenda of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Two of his early students, Liu Shu-hsien (b. 1934)  and Tu Wei-ming (b. 1940) have been especially active in raising the profile of contemporary Confucianism in English-speaking venues, as has the Canadian-born scholar John Berthrong (b. 1946). Mou’s emphasis on Kant’s transcendental analytic gave new momentum to research on Kant and post-Kantians, particularly in the work of Mou’s student Lee Ming-huei (b. 1953), and his writings on Buddhism lie behind much of the interest in and interpretation of Tiantai philosophy among Chinese scholars. Finally, Mou functions as the main modern influence on, and point of reference for, the intense research on Confucianism among mainland Chinese philosophers today.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Angle, Stephen C. Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Angle, Stephen C. Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy. Cambridge: Polity, 2012.
  • Asakura, Tomomi. “On Buddhistic Ontology: A Comparative Study of Mou Zongsan and Kyoto School Philosophy.” Philosophy East and West 61/4 (October 2011): 647-678.
  • Berthrong, John. “The Problem of Mind: Mou Tsung-san's Critique of Chu Hsi." Journal of Chinese Religion 10 (1982): 367-394.
  • Berthrong, John. All Under Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. “Mou Zongsan's Problem with the Heideggerian Interpretation of Kant.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/2 (June 2006): 225-247.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. Thinking through Confucian Modernity: A Study of Mou Zongsan's Moral Metaphysics. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Bunnin, Nicholas. “God's Knowledge and Ours: Kant and Mou Zongsan on Intellectual Intuition.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 35/4 (December 2008): 613-624.
  • Chan, N. Serina. “What is Confucian and New about the Thought of Mou Zongsan?” in New Confucianism: A Critical Examination, ed. John Makeham (New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003), 131-164.
  • Chan, N. Serina. The Thought of Mou Zongsan. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan on Zen Buddhism.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 5/1 (2005) : 73-88.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan's Transformation of Kant's Philosophy.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/1 (March 2006): 125-139.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi on Zhang Zai's and Wang Fuzhi's Philosophies of Qi : A Critical Reflection.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 10/1 (March 2011): 85-98.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “On Mou Zongsan's Hermeneutic Application of Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 174-189.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk and Henry C. H. Shiu. “Introduction: Mou Zongsan and Chinese Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 169-173.
  • Clower, Jason. The Unlikely Buddhologist: Tiantai Buddhism in the New Confucianism of Mou Zongsan. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2010.
  • Clower, Jason. “Mou Zongsan on the Five Periods of the Buddha's Teaching. Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 190-205.
  • Guo Qiyong. “Mou Zongsan’s View of Interpreting Confucianism by ‘Moral Autonomy’.” Frontiers of Philosophy in China 2/3 (June 2007): 345-362.
  • Kantor, Hans-Rudolf. “Ontological Indeterminacy and Its Soteriological Relevance: An Assessment of Mou Zongsan's (1909-1995) Interpretation of Zhiyi's (538-597) Tiantai Buddhism.” Philosophy East and West 56/1 (January 2006): 16-68.
  • Kwan, Chun-Keung. “Mou Zongsan’s Ontological Reading of Tiantai Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 206-222.
  • Lin, Chen-kuo. “Dwelling in Nearness to the Gods: The Hermeneutical Turn from MOU Zongsan to TU Weiming.” Dao 7 (2008): 381-392.
  • Lin, Tongqi and Zhou Qin. “The Dynamism and Tension in the Anthropocosmic Vision of Mou Zongsan.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 22/4 (December 1995): 401-440.
  • Liu, Shu-hsien. “Mou Tsung-san (Mou Zongsan)” in Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. A.S. Cua. New York: Routledge, 2003.
  • Mou, Tsung-san [Mou Zongsan]. “The Immediate Successor of Wang Yang-ming: Wang Lung-hsi and his Theory of Ssu-wu.” Philosophy East and West 23/1-2 (1973): 103-120.
  • Neville, Robert C. Boston Confucianism: Portable Tradition in the Late-Modern World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Stephan Schmidt. “Mou Zongsan, Hegel, and Kant: The Quest for Confucian Modernity.” Philosophy East and West 61/2 (April 2011): 260-302.
  • Shiu, Henry C.H. “Nonsubstantialism of the Awakening of Faith in Mou Zongsan.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 223-237.
  • Tang, Andres Siu-Kwong. “Mou Zongsan’s ‘Transcendental’ Interpretation of Huayan Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 238-256.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Centrality and Commonality: An Essay on Confucian Religiousness. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989.
  • Tu, Xiaofei. “Dare to Compare: The Comparative Philosophy of Mou Zongsan.” Kritike 1/2 (December 2007): 24-35.
  • Zheng Jiadong. “Mou Zongsan and the Contemporary Circumstances of the Rujia.” Contemporary Chinese Thought 36/2 (Winter 2004-5): 67-88.
  • Zheng Jiadong. “Between History and Thought: Mou Zongsan and the New Confucianism That Walked Out of History.” Contemporary Chinese Thought 36/2 (Winter 2004-5): 49-66.

Author Information

Jason Clower
California State University, Chico
U. S. A.

Differential Ontology

Differential ontology approaches the nature of identity by explicitly formulating a concept of difference as foundational and constitutive, rather than thinking of difference as merely an observable relation between entities, the identities of which are already established or known. Intuitively, we speak of difference in empirical terms, as though it is a contrast between two things; a way in which a thing, A, is not like another thing, B. To speak of difference in this colloquial way, however, requires that A and B each has its own self-contained nature, articulated (or at least articulable) on its own, apart from any other thing. The essentialist tradition, in contrast to the tradition of differential ontology, attempts to locate the identity of any given thing in some essential properties or self-contained identities, and it occupies, in one form or another, nearly all of the history of philosophy. Differential ontology, however, understands the identity of any given thing as constituted on the basis of the ever-changing nexus of relations in which it is found, and thus, identity is a secondary determination, while difference, or the constitutive relations that make up identities, is primary. Therefore, if philosophy wishes to adhere to its traditional, pre-Aristotelian project of arriving at the most basic, fundamental understanding of things, perhaps its target will need to be concepts not rooted in identity, but in difference.

“Differential ontology” is a term that may be applied particularly to the works and ideas of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze. Their successors have extended their work into cinema studies, ethics, theology, technology, politics, the arts, and animal ethics, among others.

This article consists of three main sections. The first explores a brief history of the problem. The historical emergence of the problem in ancient Greek philosophy reveals not only the dangers of a philosophy of difference, but also demonstrates that it is a philosophical problem that is central to the nature of philosophy as such, and is as old as philosophy itself. The second section explores some of the common themes and concerns of differential ontology. The third section discusses differential ontology through the specific lenses of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze.

Table of Contents

  1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy
    1. Heraclitus
    2. Parmenides
    3. Plato
    4. Aristotle
  2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology
    1. Immanence
    2. Time as Differential
    3. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics
  3. Key Differential Ontologists
    1. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist
    2. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Other Sources Cited in this Article

1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy

Although the concept of differential ontology is applied specifically to Derrida and Deleuze, the problem of difference is as old as philosophy itself. Its precursors lie in the philosophies of Heraclitus and Parmenides, it is made explicit in Plato and deliberately shut down in Aristotle, remaining so for some two and a half millennia before being raised again, and turned into an explicit object of thought, by Derrida and Deleuze in the middle of the twentieth century.

a. Heraclitus

From its earliest beginnings, what distinguishes ancient Greek philosophy from a mythologically oriented worldview is philosophy’s attempt to offer a rationally unified picture of the operations of the universe, rather than a cosmos subject to the fleeting and conflicting whims of various deities, differing from humans only in virtue of their power and immortality. The early Milesian philosophers, for instance, had each sought to locate among the various primitive elements a first principle (or archê). Thales had argued that water was the primary principle of all things, while Anaximenes had argued for air. Through various processes and permutations (or in the case of Anaximenes, rarefaction and condensation), this first principle assumes the forms of the various other elements with which we are familiar, and of which the cosmos is comprised. All things come from this primary principle, and eventually, they return to it.

Against such thinkers, Heraclitus of Ephesus (fl. c.500 BCE) argues that fire is the first principle of the cosmos: “The cosmos, the same for all, no god or man made, but it always was, is, and will be, an everlasting fire, being kindled in measures and put out in measures.” (DK22B30) From this passage, we are able to glean a few things. The most obvious divergence is that Heraclitus names fire as the basic element, rather than water, air, or, in the case of Anaximander, the boundless (apeiron). But secondly, unlike the Milesians, Heraclitus does not hold in favor of any would-be origin of the cosmos. The universe always was and always will be this self-manifesting, self-quenching, primordial fire, expressed in nature’s limitless ways. So while fire, for Heraclitus, may be ontologically basic in some sense, it is not temporally basic or primordial: it did not, in the temporal or sequential order of things, come first.

However, like his Milesian predecessors, Heraclitus appears to provide at least a basic account for how fire as first principle transforms: “The turnings of fire: first sea, and of sea, half is earth, half lightning flash.” (DK22B31a) Elsewhere we can see more clearly that fire has ontological priority only in a very limited sense for Heraclitus: “The death of earth is to become water, and the death of water is to become air, and the death of air is to become fire, and reversely.” (DK22B76) Earth becomes water; water becomes air; air becomes fire, and reversely. Combined with the two passages above, we can see that the ontological priority of fire is its transformative power. Fire from the sky consumes water, which later falls from the sky nourishing the earth. Likewise, fire underlies water (which in its greatest accumulations rages and howls as violently as flame itself), out of which comes earth and the meteorological or ethereal activity itself. Thus we can see the greatest point of divergence between Heraclitus and his Milesian forbears: the first principle of Heraclitus is not a substance. Fire, though one of the classical elements, is of its very nature a dynamic element—a vital element that is nothing more than its own transformation. It creates (volcanoes produce land masses; furnaces temper steel; heat cooks our food and keeps us safe from elemental exposure), but it also destroys in countless obvious ways; it hardens and strengthens, just as it weakens and consumes. Fire, then, is not an element in the sense of a thing, but more as a process. In contemporary scientific terms, we would say that it is the result of a chemical reaction, its essence for Heraclitus lies in its obvious dynamism. When we look at things (like tables, trees, homes, people, and so forth), they seem to exemplify a permanence which is saliently missing from our experience of fire.

This brings us to the next point: things, for Heraclitus, only appear to have permanence; or rather, their permanence is a result of the processes that make up the identities of the things in question. Here it is appropriate to cite the famous river example, found in more than one Heraclitean fragment: “You cannot step twice into the same rivers; for fresh waters are flowing in upon you.” (DK22B12) “We step and do not step into the same rivers; we are and are not.” (DK22B49a) These passages highlight the seemingly paradoxical nature of the cosmos. On the one hand, of course there is a meaningful sense in which one may step twice into the same river; one may wade in, wade back out, then walk back in again; this body of water is marked between the same banks, the same land markers, and the same flow of water, and so forth. But therein lies the paradox: the water that one waded into the first time is now completely gone, having been replaced by an entirely new configuration of particles of water. So there is also a meaningful sense in which one cannot step into the same river twice. But it is this particular flowing that makes this river this river, and nothing else. Its identity, therefore (as also my own identity), is an effervescent impermanence, constituted on the basis of the flows that make it up. We peer into nature and see things—rivers, people, animals, and so forth—but these are only temporary constitutions, even deceptions: “Men are deceived in their knowledge of things that are manifest.” (DK22B56) The true nature of nature itself, however, continuously eludes us: “Nature tends to conceal itself.” (DK22B123)

The paradoxical nature of things, (that their identities are constituted on the basis of processes), helps us to make sense of Heraclitus’ proclamation of the unity of opposites, (which both Plato and Aristotle held to be unacceptable). Fire is vital and powerful, raging beneath the appearances of nature like a primordial ontological state of warfare: “War is the father of all and the king of all.” (DK22B53) The very same process-driven nature of things that makes a thing what it is by the same operations tends toward the thing’s undoing as well. As we saw, fire is responsible for the opposite and complementary functions of both creativity and destruction. The nature of things is to tend toward their own undoing and eventual passage into their opposites: “What opposes unites, and the finest attunement stems from things bearing in opposite directions, and all things come about by strife.” (DK22B8).

It is in this sense that all things are, for Heraclitus, one. The creative-destructive operations of nature underlie all of its various expressions, binding the whole of the cosmos together in accordance with a rational principle of organization, recognized only in the universal and timeless truth that everything is constantly subject to the law of flux and impermanence: “It is wise to hearken, not to me, but to the Word [logos—otherwise translatable as reason, argument, rational principle, and so forth], and to confess that all things are one.” (DK22B50). Thus it is that Heraclitus is known as the great thinker of becoming or flux. The being of the cosmos, the most essential fact of its nature, lies in its becoming; its only permanence is its impermanence. For our purposes, we can say that Heraclitus was the first philosopher of difference. Where his predecessors had sought to identify the one primordial, self-identical substance or element, out of which all others had emerged, Heraclitus had attempted to think the world, nothing more than the world, in a permanent state (if this is not too paradoxical) of flux.

b. Parmenides

Parmenides (b. 510 BCE) was likely a young man at the time when Heraclitus was philosophically active. Born in Elea, in Lower Italy, Parmenides’ name is the one most commonly associated with Eleatic monism. While (ironically) there is no one standard interpretation of Eleatic monism, probably the most common understanding of Parmenides is filtered through our familiarity with the paradoxes of his successor, Zeno, who argued, in defense of Parmenides, that what we humans perceive as motion and change are mere illusions.

Against this backdrop, what we know of Parmenides’ views come to us from his didactic poem, titled On Nature, which now exists in only fragmentary form. Here, however, we find Parmenides, almost explicitly objecting to Heraclitus: “It is necessary to say and to think that being is; for it is to be/but it is by no means nothing. These things I bid you ponder./For from this first path of inquiry, I bar you./then yet again from that along which mortals who know nothing/wander two-headed: for haplessness in their/breasts directs wandering understanding. They are borne along/deaf and blind at once, bedazzled, undiscriminating hordes,/who have supposed that being and not-being are the same/and not the same; but the path of all is back-turning.” (DK28B6) There are a couple of important things to note here. First, the mention of those who suppose that being and not-being are the same and not the same hearkens almost explicitly to Heraclitus’ notion of the unity of opposites. Secondly, Parmenides declares this to be the opinion of the undiscriminating hordes, the masses of non-philosophically-minded mortals.

Therefore, Heraclitus, on Parmenides’ view, does not provide a philosophical account of being; rather, he simply coats in philosophical language the everyday experience of the mob. Against Heraclitus’ critical diagnosis that humans (deceptively) see only permanent things, Parmenides claims that permanence is precisely what most people, Heraclitus included, miss, preoccupied as we are with the mundane comings and goings of the latest trends, fashions, and political currents. The being of the cosmos lies not in its becoming, as Heraclitus thought. Becoming is nothing more than an illusion, the perceptions of mortal minds. What is, for Parmenides, is and cannot not be, while what is not, is not, and cannot be. Neither is it possible to even think of what is not, for to think of anything entails that it must be an object of thought. Thus to meditate on something that is not an object is, for Parmenides, contradictory. Therefore, “for the same thing is for thinking and for being.” (DK28B3)

Being is indivisible; for in order to divide being from itself, one would have to separate being from being by way of something else, either being or not-being. But not-being is not and cannot be, (so not-being cannot separate being from being). And if being is separated from being by way of being, then being itself in this thought-experiment is continuous, that is to say, being is undivided (and indivisible): “for you will not sever being from holding to being.” (DK28B4.2) Being is eternal and unchanging; for if being were to change or become in any way, this would entail that in some sense it had participated or would participate in not-being which is impossible: “How could being perish? How could it come to be?/For if it came to be, it was not, nor if it is ever about to come to be./In this way becoming has been extinguished and destruction is not heard of.” (DK28B8.19-21)

Being, for Parmenides, is thus eternal, unchanging, and indivisible spatially or temporally. Heraclitus might have been right to note the way things appear, (as a constant state of becoming) but he was wrong, on Parmenides’ view, to confuse the way things appear with the way things actually are, or with the “steadfast heart of persuasive truth.” (DK28B1.29) Likewise, Parmenides has argued, thought can only genuinely attend to being—what is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible. Whatever it is that Heraclitus has found in the world of impermanence, it is not, Parmenides holds, philosophy. While unenlightened mortals may attend to the transience of everyday life, the path of genuine wisdom lies in the eternal and unchanging. Thus, while Heraclitus had been the first philosopher of difference, Parmenides is the first to assert explicitly that self-identity, and not difference, is the basis of philosophical thought.

c. Plato

It is these two accounts, the Heraclitean and the Parmenidean (with an emphatic privileging of the latter), that Plato attempts to answer and fuse in his theory of forms. Throughout Plato’s Dialogues, he consistently gives credence to the Heraclitean observation that things in the material world are in a constant state of flux. The Parmenidean inspiration in Plato’s philosophy, however, lies in the fact that, like Parmenides, Plato will explicitly assert that genuine knowledge must concern itself only with that which is eternal and unchanging. So, given the transient nature of material things, Plato will hold that knowledge, strictly speaking, does not apply to material things specifically, but rather, to the Forms (eternal and unchanging) of which those material things are instantiations. In Book V of the Republic, Plato (through Socrates) argues that each human capacity has a matter that is proper exclusively to it. For example, the capacity of seeing has as its proper matter waves of light, while the capacity of hearing has as its proper matter waves of sound. In a proclamation that hearkens almost explicitly to Parmenides, knowledge, Socrates argues, concerns itself with being, while ignorance is most properly affiliated with not-being.

From here, the account continues, (with an eye toward Heraclitus). Everything that exists in the world participates both in being and in not-being. For example, every circle both is and is not “circle.” It is a circle to the extent that we recognize its resemblance, but it is not circle (or the absolute embodiment of what it means to be a circle) because we also recognize that no circle as manifested in the world is a perfect circle. Even the most circular circle in the world will possess minor imperfections, however slight, that will make it not a perfect circle. Thus the things in the world participate both in being and in not-being. (This is the nature of becoming). Since being and not-being each has a specific capacity proper to it, becoming, lying between these two, must have a capacity that is proper only to it. This capacity, he argues, is opinion, which, as is fitting, is that epistemological mode or comportment lying somewhere between knowledge and ignorance.

Therefore, when one’s attention is turned only to the things of the world, she can possess only opinions regarding them. Knowledge, reserved only for that domain of being, that which is and cannot not be, for Plato, applies only to the Form of the thing, or what it means to be x and nothing but x. This Form is an eternal and unchanging reality. If one has knowledge of the Form, then one can evaluate each particular in the world, in order to accurately determine whether or not it in fact accords with the principle in question. If not, one may only have opinions about the thing. For example, if one possesses knowledge of the Form of the beautiful, then one may evaluate particular things in the world—paintings, sculptures, bodies, and so forth—and know whether or not they are in fact beautiful. Lacking this knowledge, however, one may hold opinions as to whether or not a given thing is beautiful, but one will never have genuine knowledge of it. More likely, she will merely possess certain tastes on the matter—(I like this poem; I do not like that painting, and so forth.) This is why Socrates, especially in the earlier dialogues, is adamant that his interlocutors not give him examples in order to define or explain their concepts (a pious action is doing what I am doing now...). Examples, he argues, can never tell me what the Form of the thing is, (such as piety, in the Euthyphro). The philosopher, Plato holds, concerns himself with being, or the essentiality of the Form, as opposed to the lover of opinion, who concerns himself only with the fleeting and impermanent.

From this point, however, things in the Platonic account start to get more complicated. “Participation” is itself a somewhat messy notion that Plato never quite explains in any satisfactory way. After all, what does it mean to say, as Socrates argues in the Republic, that the ring finger participates in the form of the large when compared to the pinky, and in the form of the small when compared to the middle finger? It would seem to imply that a thing’s participation in its relevant Form derives, not from anything specific about its nature, but only insofar as its nature is related to the nature of another thing. But the story gets even more complicated in that at multiple points in his later dialogues, Plato argues explicitly for a Form of the different, which complicates what we typically call Platonism, almost beyond the point of recognition, (see, for example, Theaetetus 186a; Parmenides 143b, 146b, and 153a; and Sophist 254e, 257b, and 259a).

On its face, this should not be surprising. If a finger sometimes participates in the form of the large and sometimes in the form of the small, it should stand to reason that any given thing, when looked at side by side with something similar, will be said to participate in the form of the same, while by extension, when compared to something that differs in nature, will be said to participate in the form of the different—and participate more greatly in the form of the different, the more different the two things are. A baseball, side by side with a softball, will participate greatly in the form of the same, (but somewhat in the Form of the different), but when looked at side by side with a cardboard box, will participate more in the Form of the different.

But consistently articulating what a Form of the different would be is more complicated than it may at first seem. To say that the Form of x is what it means to be x and nothing but x is comprehensible enough, when one is dealing with an isolable characteristic or set of characteristics of a thing. If we say, for instance, that the Form of circle is what it means to be a circle and nothing but a circle, we know that we mean all of the essential characteristics that make a circle, a circle, (a round-plane figure the boundary of which consists of points, equidistant from a center; an arc of 360°, and so forth.). By implication, each individual Form, to the extent that it completely is what it is, also participates equally in the Form of the same, in that it is the same as itself, or it is self-identical. But what can it possibly mean to say that the form of the different is what it means to be different and nothing but different? It would seem to imply that the identity of the form of the different is that it differs, but this requires that it differs even from itself. For if the essence of the different is that it is the same as the different, (in the way that the essence of circle is self-identical to what it means to be circle), then this would entail that the essence of the Form of the different is that, to the same extent that it is different, it participates equally in the Form of the same, (or that, like the rest of the Forms, it is self-identical). But the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same; it must bear nothing of the Form of the same. But this means that the Form of the different must be different from the different as well; put otherwise, while for every other conceivable Platonic Form, one can say that it is self-identical, the Form of the different would be absolutely unique in that its nature would be defined by its self-differentiation.

But there are further complications still. Each Form in Plato’s ontology must relate to every other Form by way of the Form of the different. From this it follows that, just as the Form of the same pervades all the other Forms, (in that each is identical to itself), the Form of the different also pervades all the other Forms, (in that each Form is different from every other). This implies, in some sense, that the different is co-constitutive, along with Plato’s Form of the same, of each other individual Form. After all, part of what makes a thing what it is, (and hence, self-same, or self-identical), is that it differs from everything that it is not. To the extent that the Form of the same makes any given Form what it is, it is commensurably different from every other Form that it is not.

This complication, however, reaches its apogee when we consider the Form of the same specifically. As we said, the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same. The Form of the same differs from all other Forms as well. While, for instance, the Form of the beautiful participates in the Form of the same, (in that the beautiful is the same as the beautiful, or it is self-identical), nevertheless, the Form of the same is different from, (that is, it is not the same as) the Form of the beautiful. The Form of the same differs, similarly, from all other Forms. However, its difference from the Form of the different is a special relation. If the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same, we can say reciprocally, that the Form of the same is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the different; it relates to the different through the different. But this means that, to the extent that the Form of the same is self-same, or self-identical, it is so because it differs absolutely from the Form of the different. This entails, however, that its self-sameness derives from its maximal participation in the Form of the different itself.

We see, then, the danger posed by Plato’s Form of the different, and hence, by any attempt to formulate a concept of difference itself. Plato’s Form of the same is ubiquitous throughout his ontology; it is, in a certain sense, the glue that holds together the rest of the Forms, even if in many of his Middle Period dialogues, it never makes an explicit appearance. Simply by understanding what a Form means for Plato, we can see the central role that the Form of the same plays for this, or for that matter, any other essentialist ontology. By simply introducing a Form of the different, and attempting to rigorously think through its implications, one can see that it threatens to fundamentally undermine the Form of the same itself, and hence by implication, difference threatens to devour the whole rest of the ontological edifice of essentialism. Plato, it seems, was playing with Heraclitean fire. It is likely largely for this reason that Aristotle, Plato’s greatest student, nixes the Form of the different in his Metaphysics.

d. Aristotle

In the Metaphysics, Aristotle attempts to correct what he perceives to be many of Plato’s missteps. For our purposes, what is most important is his treatment of the notion of difference. For Aristotle inserts into the discussion a presupposition that Plato had not employed, namely, that ‘difference’ may be said only of things which are, in some higher sense, identical. Where Plato’s Form of the different may be said to relate everything to everything else, Aristotle argues that there is a conceptual distinction to be made between difference and otherness.

For Aristotle, there are various ways in which a thing may be said to be one, in terms of: (1) Continuity; (2) Wholeness or unity; (3) Number; (4) Kind. The first two are a bit tricky to distinguish, even for Aristotle. By continuity, he means the general sense in which a thing may be said to be a thing. A bundle of sticks, bound together with twine, may be said to be one, even if it is a result of human effort that has made it so. Likewise, an individual body part, such as an arm or leg, may be said to be one, as it has an isolable functional continuity. Within this grouping, there are greater and lesser degrees to which something may be said to be one. For instance, while a human leg may be said to be one, the tibia or the femur, on their own, are more continuous, (in that each is numerically one, and the two of them together form the leg).

With respect to wholeness or unity, Aristotle clarifies the meaning of this as not differing in terms of substratum. Each of the parts of a man, (the legs, the arms, the torso, the head), may be said to be, in their own way, continuous, but taken together, and in harmonious functioning, they constitute the oneness or the wholeness of the individual man and his biological and psychological life. In this sense, the man is one, in that all of his parts function naturally together towards common ends. In the same respect, a shoelace, each eyelet, the sole, and the material comprising the shoe itself, may be said to be, each in their own way, continuous, while taken together, they constitute the wholeness of the shoe.

Oneness in number is fairly straightforward. A man is one in the organic sense above, but he is also one numerically, in that his living body constitutes one man, as opposed to many men. Finally, there is generic oneness, the oneness in kind or in intelligibility. There is a sense in which all human beings, taken together, may be said to be one, in that they are all particular tokens of the genus human. Likewise, humans, cats, dogs, lions, horses, pigs, and so forth, may all be said to be one, in that they are all types of the genus animal.

Otherness is the term that Aristotle uses to characterize existent things which are, in any sense of the term, not one. There is, as we said, a sense in which a horse and a woman are one, (in that both are types of the genus animal), but an obvious sense in which they are other as well. There is a sense in which my neighbor and I are one, (in that we are both tokens of the genus human), but insofar as we are materially, emotionally, and psychologically distinct, there is a sense in which I am other than my neighbor as well. There is an obvious sense in which I and my leg are one but there is also a sense in which my leg is other than me as well, (for if I were to lose my leg in an accident, provided I received prompt and proper medical attention, I would continue to exist). Every existent thing, Aristotle argues, is by its very nature either one with or other than every other existent thing.

But this otherness does not, (as it does for Plato’s Form of the different), satisfy the conditions for what Aristotle understands as difference. Since everything that exists is either one with or other than everything else that exists, there need not be any definite sense in which two things are other. Indeed, there may be, (as we saw above, my neighbor and I are one in the sense of tokens of the genus human, but are other numerically), but there need not be. For instance, you are so drastically other than a given place, say, a cornfield, that we need not even enumerate the various ways in which the two of you are other.

This, however, is the key for Aristotle: otherness is not the same as difference. While you are other than a particular cornfield, you are not different than a cornfield. Difference, strictly speaking, applies only when there is some definite sense in which two things may be said to differ, which requires a higher category of identity within which a distinction may be drawn: “For the other and that which it is other than need not be other in some definite respect (for everything that is existent is either other or same), but that which is different is different from some particular thing in some particular respect, so that there must be something identical whereby they differ. And this identical thing is genus or species...” (Metaphysics, X.3) In other words, two human beings may be different, (that is, one may be taller, lighter-skinned, a different gender, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specific members of the genus ‘human.’ A human being may be different than a cat, (that is, one is quadripedal while the other is bipedal, one is non-rational while the other is rational, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specified members of the genus ‘animal.’

But between these two, generic and specific, specific difference or contrariety is, according to Aristotle, the greatest, most perfect, or most complete. This assessment too is rooted in Aristotle’s emphasis on identity as the basis of differentiation. Differing in genus in Aristotelian terminology means primarily belonging to different categories of being, (substance, time, quality, quantity, place, relation, and so forth.) You are other than ‘5,’ to be sure, but Aristotle would not say that you are different from ‘5,’ because you are a substance and ‘5’ is a quantity and given that these two are distinct categories of being, for Aristotle there is not really a meaningful sense in which they can be said to relate, and hence, there is not a meaningful sense in which they can be said to differ. Things that differ in genus are so far distant (closer, really, to otherness), as to be nearly incomparable. However, a man may be said to be different than a cat, because the characteristics whereby they are distinguished from each other are contrarieties, occupying opposing sides of a given either/or, for instance, rational v. non-rational. Special difference or contrariety thus provides us with an affirmation or a privation, a ‘yes’ or a ‘no’ that constitutes the greatest difference, according to Aristotle. Differences in genus are too great, while differences within species are too minute and numerous (skin color, for instance, is manifested in an infinite myriad of ways), but special contrariety is complete, embodying an affirmation or negation of a particular given quality whereby genera are differentiated into species.

There are thus two senses in which, for Aristotle, difference is thought only in accordance with a principle of identity. First, there is the identity that two different things share within a common genus. (A rock and a tree are identical in that both are members of the genus, ‘substance,’ differentiated by the contrariety of ‘living/non-living.’) Second, there is the identity of the characteristic whereby two things are differentiated: material (v. non-material), living (v. non-living), sentient (v. non-sentient), rational (v. irrational), and so forth.

We see, then, that with Aristotle, difference becomes fully codified within the tradition as the type of empirical difference that we mentioned at the outset of this article: it is understood as a recognizable relation between two things which, prior to (and independently of) their relating, possess their own self-contained identities. This difference then is a way in which a thing A, (which is identical to itself) is not like a thing B (which is identical to itself), while both belong to a higher category of identity, (in the sense of an Aristotelian genus). Given the difficulties that we encountered with Plato’s attempt to think a Form of the different, it is perhaps little wonder that Aristotle’s understanding of difference was left unchallenged for nearly two and a half millennia.

2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology

As noted in the Introduction, differential ontology is a term that can be applied to two specific thinkers (Deleuze and Derrida) of the late twentieth century, along with those philosophers who have followed in the wakes of these two. It is, nonetheless, not applicable as a school of thought, in that there is not an identifiable doctrine or set of doctrines that define what they think. Indeed, for as many similarities that one can find between them, there are likely equally many distinctions as well. They work out of different philosophical traditions: Derrida primarily from the Hegel-Husserl-Heidegger triumvirate, with Deleuze, (speaking critically of the phenomenological tradition for the most part) focusing on the trinity of Spinoza-Nietzsche-Bergson. Theologically, they are interested in different sources, with Derrida giving constant nods to thinkers in the tradition of negative theology, such as Meister Eckhart, while Deleuze is interested in the tradition of univocity, specifically in John Duns Scotus. They have different attitudes toward the history of metaphysics, with Derrida working out of the Heideggerian platform of the supposed end of metaphysics, while Deleuze explicitly rejects all talk of any supposed end of metaphysics. They hold different attitudes toward their own philosophical projects, with Derrida coining the term, (following Heidegger’s Destruktion), deconstruction, while for Deleuze, philosophy is always a constructivism. In many ways, it is difficult to find two thinkers who are less alike than Deleuze and Derrida. Nevertheless, what makes them both differential ontologists is that they are working within a framework of specific thematic critiques and assumptions, and that on the basis of these factors, both come to argue that difference in itself has never been recognized as a legitimate object of philosophical thought, to hold that identities are always constituted, on the basis of difference in itself, and to explicitly attempt to formulate such a concept. Let us now look to these thematic, structural elements.

a. Immanence

The word immanence is contrasted with the word transcendence. “Transcendence” means going beyond, while “immanence” means remaining within, and these designations refer to the realm of experience. In most monotheistic religious traditions, for instance, which emphasize creation ex nihilo, God is said to be transcendent in the sense that He exists apart from His creation. God is the source of nature, but God is not, Himself, natural, nor is he found within anything in nature except perhaps in the way in which one might see reflections of an artist in her work of art. Likewise God does not, strictly speaking, resemble any created thing. God is eternal, while created beings are temporal; God is without beginning, while created things have a beginning; God is a necessary being, while created things are contingent beings; God is pure spirit, while created things are material. The creature closest in nature to God is the human being who, according to the Biblical book of Genesis, is created in the image of God, but even in this case, God is not to be understood as resembling human beings: “For my thoughts are not your thoughts, neither are my ways your ways...” (Isaiah 55:8).

In this sense, we can say that historically, the trend in Eastern philosophies and religions (which are not as radically differentiated as they are in the Western tradition), has always leaned much more in the direction of immanence than of transcendence, and definitely more so than nearly all strains of Western monotheism. In schools of Eastern philosophy that have some notion of the divine (and a great many of them do not), many if not most understand the divine as somehow embodied or manifested within the world of nature. Such a position would be considered idolatrous in most strains of Western monotheism.

With respect to the Western philosophical tradition specifically, we can say that, even in moments when religious tendencies and doctrines do not loom large, (like they do, for instance, during the Medieval period), there nevertheless remains a dominant model of transcendence throughout, though this transcendence is emphasized in greater and lesser degrees across the history of philosophy. There have been outliers, to be sure—Heraclitus comes to mind, along with Spinoza and perhaps David Hume, but they are rare. A philosophy rooted in transcendence will, in some way, attempt to ground or evaluate life and the world on the basis of principles or criteria not found (indeed not discoverable de jure) among the living or in the world. When Parmenides asserts that the object of philosophical thought must be that which is, and which cannot not be, which is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible, he is describing something beyond the realm of experience. When Plato claims that genuine knowledge is found only in the Form; when he argues in the Phaedo that the philosophical life is a preparation for death; that one must live one’s life turning away from the desires of the body, in the purification of the spirit; when he alludes, (through the mouth of Socrates) to life as a disease, he is basing the value of this world on a principle not found in the world. When St. Paul writes that “...the flesh lusts against the Spirit, and the Spirit against the flesh; and these are contrary to one another, so that you do not do the things you wish” (Galatians 5:17), and that “the mind governed by the flesh is death,” (Romans 8:6), he is evaluating this world against another. When René Descartes recognizes his activity of thinking and finds therein a soul; when John Locke bases Ideas upon a foundation of primary qualities, immanent, allegedly, to the thing, but transcendent to our experience; when Immanuel Kant bases phenomenal appearances upon noumenal realities, which, outside of space, time, and all causality, ever elude cognition; when an ethical thinker seeks a moral law, or an absolute principle of the good against which human behaviors may be evaluated; in each of these cases, a transcendence of some sort is posited—something not found within the world is sought in order to make sense of or provide a justification for this world.

Famously, Friedrich Nietzsche argued that the history of philosophy was one of the true world finally becoming a fable. Tracing the notion of the true world from its sagely Platonic (more accurately, Parmenidean) inception up through and beyond its Kantian (noumenal) manifestation, he demonstrates that as the demand for certainty (the will to Truth) intensifies, the so-called true world becomes less plausible, slipping further and further away, culminating in the moment he called “the death of God.” The true world has now been abolished, leaving only the apparent world. But the world was only ever called apparent by comparison with a purported true world (think here of Parmenides’ castigation of Heraclitus). Thus, when the true world is abolished, the apparent world is abolished as well; and we are left with only the world, nothing more than the world.

One of the key features of differential ontology will be the adoption of Nietzsche’s proclaimed (and reclaimed) enthusiasm for immanence. Deleuze and Derrida will, each in his own way, argue that philosophy must find its basis within and take as its point of departure the notion of immanence. As we shall see below, in Deleuze’s philosophy, this emphasis on immanence will take the form of his enthusiasm for the Scotist doctrine of the univocity of being. For Derrida, it will be his lifelong commitment to the phenomenological tradition, inspired by the vast body of research conducted over nearly half a century by Edmund Husserl, out of which Derrida’s professional research platform began, (and in which he discovers the notion of différance).

b. Time as Differential

Related to the privileging of immanence is the second principle of central importance to differential ontology, a careful and rigorous analysis of time. Such analysis, inspired by Edmund Husserl, will yield the discovery of a differential structure, which stands in opposition to the traditional understanding of time, the spatially organized, puncti-linear model of time. This refers to a conglomeration of various elements from Plato, Aristotle, St. Augustine, Boethius, and ultimately, the Modern period.

Few thinkers have attempted so rigorously as Aristotle to think the paradoxical nature of time. If we take the very basic model of time as past-present-future, Aristotle notes that one part of this (the past), has been but is no more, while another part of it (the future) will be but is not yet. There is an inherent difficulty, therefore, in trying to understand what time is, because it seems as though it is composed of parts made up of things that do not exist; therefore, we are attempting to understand what something that does not exist, is.

Furthermore, the present or the now itself, for Aristotle, is not a part of time, because a part is so called because of its being a constitutive element of a whole. However, time, Aristotle claims, is not made up of nows, in the same way that a line, though it has points, is not made up of points.

Likewise, the now cannot simply remain the same, but nor can it be said to be discrete from other nows and ever-renewed. For if the now is ever the same, then everything that has ever happened is contained within the present now, (which seems absurd); but if each now is discrete, and is constantly displaced by another discrete, self-contained now, the displacement of the old now would have to take place within (or simultaneously with) the new, incoming now, which would be impossible, as discrete nows cannot be simultaneous; hence time as such would never pass.

Aristotle will therefore claim that there is a sense in which the now is constantly the same, and another sense in which it is constantly changing. The now is, Aristotle argues, both a link of and the limit between future and past. It connects future and past, but is at the same time the end of the past and the beginning of the future; but the future and the past lie on opposite sides of the now, so the now cannot, strictly speaking, belong either to the past or to the future. Rather, it divides the past from the future. The essence of the now is this division—as such, the now itself is indivisible, “the indivisible present ‘now’.” (Physics IV.13). Insofar as each now succeeds another in a linear movement from future to past, the now is ever-changing—what is predicated of the now is constantly filled out in an ever-new way. But structurally speaking, inasmuch as the now is always that which divides and unites future and past, it is constantly the same.

Without the now, there would be no time, Aristotle argues, and vice versa. For what we call time is merely the enumeration that takes place in the progression of history between some moment, future or past, relative to the now moment: “For time is just this—number of motion in respect of ‘before’ and ‘after’.” (Physics, IV.11)

Here, then, are the elements that Aristotle leaves us with: an indivisible now moment that serves as the basis of the measure of time, which is a progression of enumeration taking place between moments, and a notion of relative distance that marks that progression of enumeration.

In Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius, we find an important distinction between time and eternity: (it is important to note that Aristotle’s discussion of time is found in his Physics, not in his Metaphysics, because time, as the measure of change, belongs only to the things of nature, not to the divine). The reason that this is an important distinction for our purposes is that eternity, (for Plato, Augustine, and Boethius), is the perspective of the divine, while temporality is the perspective of creation. Eternity, for all three of these thinkers, does not mean passing through every moment of time in the sense of having always been there, and always being there throughout every moment of the future, (which is called ‘sempiternity’). All three of these philosophers view time as itself a created thing, and eternity, the perspective of the divine, stands outside of time.

Having created the entire spectrum of time, and standing omnisciently outside of time, the divine sees the whole of time, in an ever-present now. This complete fullness of the now is how Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius understand eternity. Once we have made this move, however, it is a very short leap to the conclusion that, in a sense, all of time is ever-present; certainly not from our perspective, but from the perspective of the divine. In other words, right now, in an ever-present now, God is seeing the exodus of the Israelites, the sacking of Troy, the execution of Socrates, the crucifixion of Jesus, the fall of the Roman Empire, and the moment (billions of years from now) that the sun will become a Red Giant. Therefore, what we call the now is, on this model, no more or less significant, and no more or less NOW, than any other moment in time. It only appears to be so, from our very limited, finite perspectives. From the perspective of eternity, however, each present is equally present. Plato refers to time in the Timaeus as a “moving image of eternity.” (Timaeus, 37d)

The final piece of the puncti-linear model of time comes from the historical moment of the scientific revolution, with the conceptual birth of absolute time. On the Modern view, time is not the Aristotelian measure of change; rather, the measure of change is how we typically perceive time. Time, in and of itself, however, just is, in the same way that space, on the Modern view, just is—it is mathematical, objectively uniform and unitary, and the same in all places, its units (or moments) unfolding with precise regularity. Though the term “absolute time” was officially introduced by Sir Isaac Newton in his Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica (1687), as that which “from its own nature flows equably without regard to anything external,” it is nevertheless clear that the experiments and theories of both Johannes Kepler and Galileo Galilei (both of whom historically preceded Newton) assume a model of absolute time. None other than René Descartes, the philosopher who did more than any other to usher in the modern sciences, writes in the third of his famous Meditations on First Philosophy, (where he argues for the existence of God) “for the whole time of my life may be divided into an infinity of parts, each of which is in no way dependent on any other...”

The puncti-linear model of time, then, conceives the whole of time as a series of now-points, or moments, each of which makes up something like an atom of time (as the physical atom is a unit of space). Each of those moments is ontologically and logically independent of every other, with the present moment being the now-point most alive. The past, then, is conceived as those presents that have come and gone, while the future is conceived as those presents that have not yet come, and insofar as we speak of past and future moments as occupying points of greater and lesser distances with respect to the present and to each other as well, we are, whether we realize it or not, conceiving of time as a linear progression; thus when we attempt to understand the essence of time, we tend to conceptually spatialize it. This prejudice is most easily seen in the ease with which our mind leaps to timelines in order to conceptualize relations of historical events.

Edmund Husserl, whose 1904-1905 lectures On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time probably did more to shape the future of the continental tradition in philosophy in the twentieth century than any other single text, was also very influential on the issue of time consciousness. There, Husserl constructs a model of time consciousness that he calls “the living present.” Whether or not there is any such thing as real time, or absolute time is, for Husserl, one of those questions that is bracketed in the performance of the phenomenological epochē; time, for Husserl, as everything else, is to be analyzed in terms of its objective qualities, in other words, in terms of how it is lived by a constituting subject. Husserl’s point of departure is to object to the theory of experience offered by Husserl’s mentor, Franz Brentano. Assuming (though not making explicit) the puncti-linear model of time, Brentano distinguishes between two basic types of experience. The primary mode is perception, which is the consciousness of the present now-point. All modes of the past are understood in terms of memory, which is the imagined recollection or representation of a now-moment no longer present. If you are asked to call to mind your celebration of your tenth birthday, you are employing the faculty of memory. And every mode of experience dealing with the past (or the no-longer-present), is understood by Brentano as memory.

This understanding presents a problem, though. From the moment you began reading the first word of this sentence, from, until this moment right now, as you are reading these words, there is a type of memory being employed. Indeed, in order to genuinely experience any given experience as an experience, and not just a random series of moments, there must be some operation of memory taking place. To cognize a song as a song, rather than a random series of notes, we must have some memory of the notes that have come just before, and so on. However, the type of memory that is being used here seems to be qualitatively different than the sort of memory employed when you are encouraged to reflect upon your tenth birthday, or even, to reflect upon what you had for dinner last night. This type of reflection, (or representation) is a calling-back-to-mind of an event that was experienced at some point in the past, but has long since left consciousness, while the other (the sort of memory it takes to cognize a sentence or a paragraph, for instance), is an operative memory of an event that has not yet left consciousness. Both are modes of memory, to be sure, but they are qualitatively different modes of memory, Husserl argues.

Moreover, in each moment of experience, we are at the same time looking forward to the future in some mode of expectation. This, too, is something we experience on a frequent basis. For instance, when walking through a door that we walk through frequently, we might casually tap the handle and lead with our head and shoulders because we expect that the door, unlocked, will open for us as it always does; when sitting at the bus stop, as the bus approaches the curb, we stand, because we expect that it is our bus, and that it is stopping to let us on. Our expectations are not quite as salient as are our primary memories, but they are there. All it takes is a rupture of some sort—the door may be locked, causing us to hit our head; the bus may not be our bus, or the driver may not see us and may continue driving—to realize that the structure of expectation was present in our consciousness.

Time, Husserl argues, is not experienced as a series of discrete, independent moments that arise and instantly die; rather, experience of the present is always thick with past and future. What Aristotle refers to as the now, Husserl calls the ‘primal impression,’ the moment of impact between consciousness and its intentional object, which is ever-renewed, but also ever-passing away; but the primal impression is constantly surrounded by a halo of retention (or primary memory) and protention (primary expectation). This structure, taken altogether, is what Husserl calls, “the living present.”

Derrida and Deleuze will each employ (while subjecting to strident criticism) Husserl’s concept of the living present. If the present is always constituted as a relation of past to future, then the very nature of time is itself relational, that is to say, it cannot be conceived as points on a line or as seconds on a clock. If time is essentially or structurally relational, then everything we think about ‘things’ (insofar as things are constituted in time), and knowledge (insofar as it takes place in time), will be radically transformed as well. To fully think through the implications of Husserl’s discovery entails a fundamental reorientation toward time and along with it, being. Deleuze employs the retentional-protentional structure of time, while discarding the notion of the primal impression. Derrida will stick with the terms of Husserl’s structure, while demonstrating that the present in Husserl is always infected with or contaminated by the non-present, the structure of which Derrida calls différance.

c. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics

In a sense it is difficult to talk in a synthetic way about what Deleuze and Derrida find wrong with traditional metaphysics, because they each, in the context of their own specific projects, find distinct problems with the history of metaphysics. However, the following is clear: (1) If we can use the term ‘metaphysics’ to characterize the attempt to understand the fundamental nature of things, and; (2) If we can acknowledge that traditionally the effort to do that has been carried out through the lenses of representational thinking in some form or other, then; (3) the critiques that Deleuze and Derrida offer against the history of metaphysical thinking are centered around the point that traditional metaphysics ultimately gets things wrong.

For Deleuze, this will come down to a necessary and fundamental imprecision that accompanies traditional metaphysics. Inasmuch as the task of metaphysics is to think the nature of the thing, and inasmuch as it sets for itself essentialist parameters for doing so, it necessarily filters its own understanding of the thing through conceptual representations, philosophy can never arrive at an adequate concept of the individual. To our heart’s desire, we may compound and multiply the concepts that we use to characterize a thing, but there will always necessarily be some aspect of that thing left untouched by thinking. Let us use a simple example, an inflated ball—we can describe it by as many representational concepts as we like: it is a certain color or a certain pattern, made of a certain material (rubber or plastic, perhaps), a certain size, it has a certain degree of elasticity, is filled with a certain amount of air, and so forth. However many categories or concepts we may apply to this ball, the nature of this ball itself will always elude us. Our conceptual characterization will always reach a terminus; our concepts can only go so far down. The ball is these characterizations, but it is also different from its characterizations as well. For Deleuze, if our ontology cannot reach down to the thing itself, if it is structurally and essentially incapable of comprehending the constitution of the thing, (as any substance metaphysics will be), then it is, for the most part, worthless as an ontology.

Derrida casts his critiques of the history of metaphysics in the Heideggerian language of presence. The history of philosophy, Derrida argues, is the metaphysics of presence, and the Western religious and philosophical tradition operates by categorizing being according to conceptual binaries: (good/evil, form/matter, identity/difference, subject/object, voice/writing, soul/body, mind/body, invisible/visible, life/death, God/Satan, heaven/earth, reason/passion, positive/negative, masculine/feminine, true/apparent, light/dark, innocence/fallenness, purity/contamination, and so forth.) Metaphysics consists of first establishing the binary, but from the moment it is established, it is already clear which of the two terms will be considered the good term and which the pejorative term—the good term is the one that is conceptually analogous to presence in either its spatial or temporal sense. The philosopher’s task, then, is to isolate the presence as the primary term, and to conceptually purge it of its correlative absent term.

A few examples will help elucidate this point: for Parmenides, divine wisdom entails an attempt to think that which is, at every present moment, the same. Heraclitean flux is the way of the masses. This in part shapes Plato’s emphasis on the eternality of the Form—while the material world changes with the passage of each new present, the Form remains the same, (ever-present or eternal); but in addition, the Form is also that which is closest to (a term of presence) the nature of the soul. In Plato the body, (given that it is in constant flux), is the prison of the soul, and in the Phaedo, life is declared a disease, for which death is the cure. In Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, the most complete happiness for the human being lies in the life of contemplation, because the capacity for contemplation is that which makes us most like the gods, (who are ever the same). So we would be happiest if we could contemplate all the time; however, we unfortunately cannot (as we also have bodies and so, various familial, social, and political responsibilities). In Christianity, the flesh is subject to change (which is the very essence of corruptibility) while the Spirit is incorruptible (or ever-present); for Descartes, (and for the early phenomenological tradition), only what is spatially present (that is, immediate to consciousness), is indubitable. Whether or not the object of my present perception exists in the so-called real world, it is nevertheless indubitable that I am experiencing what I am experiencing, in the moment at which I am experiencing it—Descartes even goes so far as to define clarity (one of his conditions for ‘truth’) as that which is present. And for Descartes, the body (insofar as it is at least possible to doubt its existence), is not most essentially me; rather, my soul is what I am. We saw Aristotle’s emphasis on the now, or the present, as the yardstick against which time is measured. The spatial and temporal senses of the emphasis on presence are completely solidified in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, whose phenomenological reduction attempts to focus its attention exclusively on the phenomena of consciousness, because only then can it accord with the philosophical demand for apodicticity; and he understands this experience as constituted on the model of the living present. In each of these cases, a presence is valorized, and its correlative absence is suppressed.

As was the case with Deleuze, however, Derrida will argue that the self-proclaimed task of metaphysics ultimately fails. Thus, (and against some of his more dismissive critics), Derrida operates in the name of truth—when the history of metaphysics posits that presence is primary, and absence secondary, this claim, Derrida shows, is false. Metaphysics, in all of its manifestations, attempts to cast out the impure, but somehow, the impure always returns, in the form of a supplementary term; the secondary term is always ultimately required in order to supplement the primary term. Derrida’s project then is dedicated to demonstrating that if the subordinate term is required in order to supplement the so-called primary term, it can only be because the primary term suffers always and originally from a lack or a deficiency of some sort. In other words, the absence that philosophy sought to cast out was present and infecting the present term from the origin.

3. Key Differential Ontologists

a. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist

It is in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, as we said above, that Derrida discovers the constitutive play known as différance. In its effort to isolate ideal essences, constituted within the sphere of consciousness, phenomenology brackets or suspends all questions having to do with the real existence of the external world, the belief in which Husserl refers to as the natural attitude. The natural attitude is the non-thematic subjective attitude that takes for granted the real existence of the real world, absent and apart from my (or any) experience of it. Science or philosophy, in the mode of the natural attitude, ontologically distinguishes being from our perceptions of being, from which point it becomes impossible to ever again bridge the gap between the two. Try as it might, philosophy in the natural attitude can only ever have representations of being, and certainty (the telos of philosophical activity) becomes untenable. With this in mind, we get Husserl’s famous principle of all principles: “that everything originarily… offered to us in ‘intuition’ is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there.” (Ideas I, §24) Husserl thus proposes a change in attitude, in what he calls the phenomenological epochē, which suspends all questions regarding the external existence of the objects of consciousness, along with the constituting priority of the empirical self. Both self and world are bracketed, revealing the correlative structure of the world itself in relation to consciousness thereof, opening a sphere of pure immanence, or, in Derrida’s terminology, pure presence. It is for this reason that Husserl represents for Derrida the most strident defense of the metaphysics of presence, and it is for this reason that his philosophy also serves as the ground out of which the notion of constitutive difference is discovered.

In his landmark 1967 text, Voice and Phenomenon, Derrida takes on Husserl’s notion of the sign. The sign, we should note, is typically understood as a stand-in for something that is currently absent. Linguistically a sign is a means by which a speaker conveys to a listener the meaning that currently resides within the inner experience of the speaker. The contents of one person’s experience cannot be transferred or related to the experience of a listener except through the usage of signs, (which we call ‘language’). Knowing this, and knowing that Husserl’s philosophy is an attempt to isolate a pure moment of presence, it is little wonder that he wants, inasmuch as it is possible, to do away with the usage of signs, and isolate an interior moment of presence. It is precisely this aim that Derrida takes apart.

In the opening chapter of Husserl’s First Logical Investigation, titled “Essential Distinctions,” Husserl draws a distinction between different types or functions of signs: expressions and indications. He claims signs are always pointing to something, but what they point to can assume different forms. An indication signifies without pointing to a sense or a meaning. The flu or bodily infection, for instance, is not the meaning of the fever, but it is brought to our attention by way of the fever—the fever, that is, points to an ailment in the body. An expression, however, is a sign that is, itself, charged with conceptual meaning; it is a linguistic sign. There are countless types of signs—animal tracks in the snow point to the recent presence of life, a certain aroma in the house may indicate that a certain food or even a certain ethnicity of food, is being prepared—but expressions are signs that are themselves meaningful.

This distinction (indication/expression) is itself problematic, however, and does not seem to be fundamentally sustainable. An indication may very well be an expression, and expressions are almost always indications. If one’s significant other leaves one a note on the table, for instance, before one has even read the words on the paper, the sheer presence of writing, left in a certain way, on a sheet of paper, situated a certain way on the table, indicates: (1) That the beloved is no longer in the house, and; (2) That the beloved has left one a message to be read. These signs are both indications and expressions. Furthermore, every time we use an expression of some sort, we are indicating something, namely, we are pointing toward an ideal meaning, empirical states of affairs, and so forth. In effect, one would be hard pressed to find a single example of a use of an expression that was not, in some sense, indicative.

Husserl, however, will argue that even if, in fact, expressions are always caught up in an indicative function, that this has nothing to do with the essential distinction, obtaining de jure (if not de facto) between indications and expressions. Husserl cannot relinquish this conviction because, after all, he is attempting to isolate a pure moment of self-presence of meaning. So if expressions are signs charged with meaning, then Husserl will be compelled to locate a pure form of expression, which will require the absolute separation of the expression from its indicative function. Indeed he thinks that this is possible. The reason expressions are almost always indicative is that we use them to communicate with others, and in the going-forth of the sign into the world, some measure of the meaning is always lost—no matter how many signs we use to articulate our experience, the experience can never be perfectly and wholly recreated within the mind of the listener. So to isolate the expressive essence of the expression, we must suspend the going-forth of the sign into the world. This is accomplished in the soliloquy of the inner life of consciousness.

In one’s interior monologue, there is nothing empirical, (nothing from the world), and hence, nothing indicative. The signs themselves have only ideal, not real, existence. Likewise, the signs employed in the interior monologue are not indicative in the way that signs in everyday communication are. Communicative expressions point us to states of affairs or the internal experiences of another person; in short, they point us to empirical events. Expressions of the interior monologue, however, do not point us to empirical realities, but rather, Husserl claims that in the interior expression, the sign points away from itself, and toward its ideal sense. For Husserl, therefore, the purest, most meaningful mode of expression is one in which nothing is, strictly speaking, expressed to anyone.

One might nevertheless wonder, is it not the case, that when one ‘converses’ internally with oneself, that one is, in some sense, articulating meaning to oneself? Here is a mundane example, one which has happened to each of us at some point in time: we walk into a room, and forget why we have entered the room. “Why did I come in here?” we might silently utter to ourselves, and after a moment, we might say to ourselves, “Ah, yes, I came in here to turn down the thermostat,” or something of the like. Is it not the case that the individual is communicating something to herself in this monologue?

Husserl responds in the negative. The signs we are using are not making known to the self a content that was previously inaccessible to the self, (which is what takes place in communication). In pointing away from itself and directly toward the sense, the sense is not conveyed from a self to a self, but rather, the sense of the expression is experienced by the subject at exactly that same moment in time.

This is where Derrida brings into the discussion Husserl’s notion of the living present, for this emphasis on the exact same moment in time relies upon Husserl’s notion of the primal impression. Derrida writes, “The sharp point of the instant, the identity of lived-experience present to itself in the same instant bears therefore the whole weight of this demonstration.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 51). In our discussion above of Husserl’s living present, we saw that the primal impression is constantly displaced by a new primal impression—it is in constant motion. Nevertheless, this does not keep Husserl from referring to the primal impression in terms of a point; it is, he says, the source-point on the basis of which retention is established. While the primal impression is always, as we saw with Husserl, surrounded by a halo of retention and protention, nevertheless this halo is always thought from the absolute center of the primal impression, as the source-point of experience. It is the “non-displaceable center, an eye or living nucleus” of temporality. (Voice and Phenomenon, 53)

This, we note, is the Husserlian manifestation of the emphasis on the temporal sense of presence in the philosophical tradition. Here, we should also note: Derrida never attempts to argue that philosophy should move away from the emphasis on presence. The philosophical tradition is defined by, Derrida claims, its emphasis on the present; the present provides the very foundation of certainty throughout the history of philosophy; it is certainty, in a sense. The present comprises an ineliminable essential element of the whole endeavor of philosophy. So to call it into question is not to try to bring a radical transformation to philosophy, but to shift one’s vantage point to one that inhabits the space between philosophy and non-philosophy. Indeed, Derrida motions in this direction, which is one of the reasons that Derrida is more comfortable than many traditional academic philosophers writing in the style of and in communication with literary figures. The emphasis on presence within philosophy, strictly speaking is incontestable.

Husserl, we saw, formulated his notion of the living present on the basis of his insistence on a qualitative distinction between retention as a mode of memory still connected to the present moment of consciousness, and representational memory, that deliberately calls to mind a moment of the past that has, since its occurrence, left consciousness. This means, for Husserl, that retention must be understood in the mode of Presentation, as opposed to Representation. Retention is a direct intuition of what has just passed, directly presented, and fully seen, in the moment of the now, as opposed to represented memory, which is not. Retention is not, strictly speaking, the present; the primal impression is the present. Nevertheless, retention is still attached to the moment of the now. Furthermore, there is a sense in which retention is necessary to give us the experience of the present as such. The primal impression, where the point of contact occurs, is in a constant mode of passing away, and the impression only becomes recognizable in the mode of retention—as we said, to truly experience a song as a song entails that one must keep in one’s memory the preceding few notes; but this is just another way of saying that the present is constituted in part on the basis of memory, even if memory of what has just passed.

Derrida diagnoses, then, a tension operating at the heart of Husserl’s thinking. On the one hand, Husserl’s phenomenology requires the sharp point of the instant in order to have a pure moment of self-presence, wherein meaning, without the intermediary of signs, can be found. In this sense, retention, though primary memory, is memory nonetheless, and does not give us the present, but is rather, Husserl claims, the “antithesis of perception.” (On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time, 41) Nevertheless, the present as such is only ever constituted on the basis of its becoming concretized and solidified in the acts that constitute the stretching out of time, in retention. Moreover, given that retention is still essentially connected to the primal impression, (which is itself always in the mode of passing away) there is not a radical distinction between retention and primal impression; rather, they are continuous, and the primal impression is really only, Husserl claims, an ideal limit. There is thus a continual accommodation of Husserlian presence to non-presence, which entails the admission of a form of otherness into the self-present now-point of experience. This accommodation is what keeps fundamentally distinct memory as retention and memory as representation.

Nevertheless, the common root, making possible both retention and representational memory, is the structural possibility of repetition itself, which Derrida calls the trace. The trace is the mark of otherness, or the necessary relation of interiority to exteriority. Husserl’s living present is marked by the structure of the trace, Derrida argues, because the primal impression for Husserl, never occurs without a structural retention attached to it. Thus, in the very moment, the selfsame point of time, when the primal impression is impressed within experience, what is essentially necessary to the structure, (in other words, not an accidental feature thereof), is the repeatability of the primal impression within retention. To be experienced in a primal impression therefore requires that the object of experience be repeatable, such that it can mark itself within the mode of retention, and ultimately, representational memory. Thus the primal impression is traced with exteriority, or non-presence, before it is ever empirically stamped.

On the basis of this trace that constitutes the presence of the primal impression, Derrida introduces the concept of différance:

[T]he trace in the most universal sense, is a possibility that must not only inhabit the pure actuality of the now, but must also constitute it by means of the very movement of the différance that the possibility inserts into the pure actuality of the now. Such a trace is, if we are able to hold onto this language without contradicting it and erasing it immediately, more ‘originary’ than the phenomenological originarity itself... In all of these directions, the presence of the present is thought beginning from the fold of the return, beginning from the movement of repetition and not the reverse. Does not the fact that this fold in presence or in self-presence is irreducible, that this trace or this différance is always older than presence and obtains for it its openness, forbid us from speaking of a simple self-identity ‘im selben Augenblick’? (Voice and Phenomenon, 58)

Différance, Derrida says, is a movement, a differentiating movement, on the basis of which the presence (the ground of philosophical certainty) is opened up. The self-presence of subjectivity, in which certainty is established, is inseparable from an experience of time, and the structural essentialities of the experience of time are marked by the trace. It is more originary than the primordiality of phenomenological experience, because it is what makes it possible in the first place. From this it follows, Derrida claims, that Husserl’s project of locating a moment of pure presence will be necessarily thwarted, because in attempting to rigorously think it through, we have found hiding behind it this strange structure signifying a movement and hence, not a this, that Derrida calls différance.

Using Derrida’s terminology, (which we shall presently dissect), we can say that différance is the non-originary, constituting-disruption of presence. Let us take this bit by bit. Différance is constituting—this signifies, as we saw in Husserl, that it is on the basis of this movement that presence is constituted. Derrida claims that it is the play of différance that makes possible all modes of presence, including the binary categories and concepts in accordance with which philosophy, since Plato, has conducted itself. That it is constitutive does not, however, mean that it is originary, at least not without qualification. To speak of origins, for Derrida, implies an engagement with a presumed moment of innocence or purity, in other words, a moment of presence, from which our efforts at meaning have somehow fallen away. Derrida says, rather, that différance is a “non-origin which is originary.” (“Freud and the Scene of Writing,” Writing and Difference, 203) Différance is, in a sense, an origin, but one that is already, at the origin, contaminated; hence it is a non-originary origin.

At the same time, because différance as play and movement always underlie the constitutive functioning of philosophical concepts, it likewise always attenuates this functioning, even as it constitutes it. Différance prevents the philosophical concepts from ever carrying out fully the operations that their author intends them to carry out. This constituting-disruption is the source of one of Derrida’s more (in)famous descriptions of the deconstructive project: “But this condition of possibility turns into a condition of impossibility.” (Of Grammatology, 74)

Différance attenuates both senses of presence to which we referred above: (1) Spatially, it differs, creating spaces, ruptures, chasms, and differences, rather than the desired telos of absolute proximity; (2) Temporally, it defers, delaying presence from ever being fully attained. Thus it is that Derrida, capitalizing on the “two motifs of the Latin differre...” will understand différance in the dual sense of differing and deferring (“Différance,” in Margins of Philosophy, 8)

Derrida is therefore a differential ontologist in that, through his critiques of the metaphysical tradition, he attempts to think the fundamental explicitly on the basis of a differential structure, reading the canonical texts of the philosophical tradition both with and against the intentions of their authors. In so doing, he attempts to expose the play of force underlying the constitution of meaning, and thereby, to open new trajectories of thinking, rethinking the very concept of the concept, and forging a path “toward the unnameable.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 66)

b. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist

As early as 1954, in one of Deleuze’s first publications, (a review of Jean Hyppolite’s book, Logic and Existence), Deleuze stresses the urgency for an ontology of pure difference, one that does not rely upon the notion of negation, because negation is merely difference, pushed to its outermost limit. An ontology of pure difference means an attempt to think difference as pure relation, rather than as a not-.

The reason for this urgency, as we saw above, is that the task of philosophy is to have a direct relation to things, and in order for this to happen, philosophy needs to grasp the thing itself, and this means, the thing as it differs from everything else that it is not, the thing as it essentially is. Reason, he claims, must reach down to the level of the individual. In other words, philosophy must attempt to think what he calls internal difference, or difference internal to Being itself. Above we noted that however many representational concepts we may adduce in order to characterize a thing, (our example above was a ball), so long as we are using concepts rooted in identity to grasp it, we will still be unable to think down to the level of what makes this, this. Therefore, philosophy suffers from an essential imprecision, which only differential ontology can repair.

This imprecision is rooted, Deleuze argues, in the Aristotelian moment, specifically in Aristotle’s metaphysics of analogy. Aristotle’s notion of metaphysics as first philosophy is that, while other sciences concentrate on one or another domain of being, metaphysics is to be the science of being qua being. Unlike every other science, (which all study some genus or species of being), the object of the metaphysical science, being qua being, is not a genus. This is because any given genus is differentiated (by way of differences) into species. Any species, beneath its given genus, is fully a member of that genus, but the difference that has so distinguished it, is not. Let us take an example: the genus animal. In this case, the difference, we might say, is rational, by which the genus animal is speciated into the species of man and beast, for Aristotle. Both man and beast are equally members of the genus animal, but rational, the differentia whereby they are separated, is not. Differentiae cannot belong, properly, to the given genus of which they are differentiae, and yet, differences exist, that is, they have being. Therefore, if differences have being, and the differentiae of any given genus cannot belong, properly speaking, to that genus, it follows that being cannot be a genus.

Metaphysics therefore cannot be the science of being as such, (because, given that there is no genus, ‘being,’ there is no being as such), but rather, of being qua being, or, put otherwise, the science that focuses on beings insofar as they are said to be. The metaphysician, Aristotle holds, must study being by way of abstraction—all that is is said to be in virtue of something common, and this commonality, Aristotle holds, is rooted in a thing’s being a substance, or a bearer of properties. The primary and common way in which a thing is said to be, Aristotle argues, is that it is a substance, a bearer of properties. Properties are, no doubt, but they are only to the extent that there is a substance there to bear them. There is no ‘red’ as such; there are only red things. Metaphysics, therefore, is the science that studies primarily the nature of what it means to be a substance, and what it means to be an attribute of a substance, but insofar as it relates to a substance. All of these other qualities, and along with them, the Aristotelian categories, are related analogically, through substances, to being. This explains Aristotle’s famous dictum: Being is said in many ways. (Metaphysics, IV.2) This is Aristotle’s doctrine known as the equivocity of being. Being is hierarchical in that there are greater and lesser degrees to which a thing may be said to be. In this sense, analogical being is a natural bedfellow with the theological impetus, in that it provides a means of speaking and thinking about God that does not flirt with heresy, that falls into neither of the two following traps: (1) Believing that a finite mind could ever possess knowledge of an infinite being; (2) Thinking that God’s qualities, for instance, his love or his mercy, are to be understood in like fashion to our own. Analogical being easily and naturally allows the Scholastic tradition to hierarchize the scala naturae, the great chain of being, thus creating a space in language and in thought for the ineffable.

Deleuze, however, will argue that the Aristotelian equivocity disallows ontology a genuine concept of Being, of the individual, or of difference itself: “However, this form of distribution commanded by the categories seemed to us to betray the nature of Being (as a cardinal and collective concept) and the nature of the distributions themselves (as nomadic rather than sedentary and fixed distributions), as well as the nature of difference (as individuating difference).” (Difference and Repetition, 269) By ‘cardinal’ and ‘collective,’ respectively, Deleuze means Being as the fundamental nature of what-is, (which is the individuating power of differentiation) and being as the whole of what-is. Analogical being, Deleuze objects, cannot think being as such (because being is not a genus, for Aristotle), and then, because it posits substances and categories (fixed, rather than fluid, models of distribution of being), it misses the nature of difference itself (because difference is always ‘filtered’ through a higher concept of identity), as well as the ability to think the individual (because thought can only go as far ‘down’ as the substance, which is always comprehended through our concepts). Thus, ontology, understood analogically, cannot do what it is designed to do: to think being.

To think a genuine concept of difference (and hence, being) requires an ontology which abandons the analogical model of being and affirms the univocity of being, that being is said in only one sense of everything of which it is said. Here, Deleuze cites three key figures that have made such a transformation in thinking possible: John Duns Scotus, Benedict de Spinoza, and Friedrich Nietzsche.

Deleuze calls Duns Scotus’ book, the Opus Oxoniense, “the greatest book of pure ontology.” (Difference and Repetition, 39) Scotus argues against Thomas Aquinas, and hence, against the Aristotelian doctrine of equivocity, in an effort to salvage the reliability of proofs for God’s existence, rooted, as they must be, in the experiences and the minds of human beings. Any argument that draws a conclusion about the being of God on the basis of some fact about his creatures presupposes, Scotus thinks, the univocal expression of the term, ‘being.’ If the being of God is wholly other, or even, analogous to, the being of man, then the relation of the given premises to the conclusion, “God exists,” thereby loses all validity. While, as noted, understanding being analogically affords the theological tradition a handy way of keeping the creation distinct from its creator, this same distance, Scotus thinks, also keeps us from truly possessing natural knowledge about God. So in order to save that knowledge, Scotus had to abolish the analogical understanding of being. However, Deleuze notes, in order to keep from falling into a heresy of another sort (namely, pantheism, the conviction that everything is God), Scotus had to neutralize univocal being. The abstract concept of being precedes the division into the categories of “finite” and “infinite,” so that, even if being is univocal, God’s being is nevertheless distinguished from man’s by way of God’s infinity. Being is therefore, univocal, but neutral and abstract, not affirmed.

Spinoza offers the next step in the affirmation of univocal being. Spinoza creates an elaborate ontology of expression and immanent causality, consisting of substance, attributes, and modes. There is but one substance, God or Nature, which is eternal, self-caused, necessary, and absolutely infinite. A given attribute is conceived through itself and is understood as constituting the essence of a substance, while a mode is an affection of a substance, a way a substance is. God is absolutely free because there is nothing outside of Nature which could determine God to act in such and such a way, so God expresses himself in his creation from the necessity of his own Nature. God’s nature is his power, and his power is his virtue. It is sometimes said that Spinoza’s God is not the theist’s God, and this is no doubt true, but it is equally true that Spinoza’s Nature is not the naturalist’s nature, because Spinoza equates Nature and God; in other words, he makes the world of Nature an object of worshipful admiration, or affirmation. Thus Spinoza takes the step that Scotus could not; nevertheless, Spinoza does not quite complete the transformation to the univocity of being. Spinoza leaves intact the priority of the substance over its modes. Modes can be thought only through substance, but the converse is not true. Thus for the great step Spinoza takes towards the immanentizing of philosophy, he leaves a tiny bit of transcendence untouched. Deleuze writes, “substance must itself be said of the modes and only of the modes.” (Difference and Repetition, 40)

This shift is made, Deleuze claims, with Nietzsche’s notion of eternal return. Deleuze understands Nietzsche’s eternal return in the terms of what Deleuze calls the disjunctive synthesis. In the disjunctive synthesis, we find the in itself of Deleuze’s notion of difference in itself. The eternal return, or the constant returning of the same as the different, constitutes systems, but these systems are, as we saw above, nomadic and fluid, constituted on the basis of disjunctive syntheses, which is itself a differential communication between two or more divergent series.

Given in experience, Deleuze claims, is diversity—not difference as such, but differences, different things, limits, oppositions, and so forth. But this experience of diversity presupposes, Deleuze claims, “a swarm of differences, a pluralism of free, wild, untamed differences; a properly differential and original space and time.” (Difference and Repetition, 50) In other words, the perceived, planar effects of limitations and oppositions presuppose a pure depth or a sub-phenomenal play of constitutive difference. Insofar as they are the conditions of space and time as we sense them, this depth that he is looking for is itself an imperceptible spatio-temporality. This depth (or ‘pure spatium’), he claims, is where difference, singularities, series, and systems, relate and interact. It is necessary, Deleuze claims, because the developmental and differential processes whereby living systems are constituted take place so rapidly and violently that they would tear apart a fully-formed being. Deleuze, comparing the world to an egg, argues that there are “systematic vital movements, torsions and drifts, that only the embryo can sustain: an adult would be torn apart by them.” (Difference and Repetition, 118)

At the embryonic level are series, with each series being defined by the differences between its terms, rather than its terms themselves. Rather, we should say that its terms are themselves differences, or what Deleuze calls intensities: “Intensities are implicated multiplicities, ‘implexes,’ made up of relations between asymmetrical elements.” (Difference and Repetition, 244). An intensity is essentially an energy, but an energy is always a difference or an imbalance, folded in on itself, an essentially elemental asymmetry. These intensities are the terms of a given series. The terms, however, are themselves related to other terms, and through these relations, these intensities are continuously modified. An intensity is an embryonic quantity in that its own internal resonance, which is constitutive of higher levels of synthesis and actualization, pulsates in a pure speed and time that would devastate a constituted being; it is for this reason that qualities and surface phenomena can only come to be on a plane in which difference as such is cancelled or aborted. In explicating its implicated differences, the system, so constituted, cancels out those differences, even if the differential ground rumbles beneath.

A system is formed whenever two or more of these heterogeneous series communicate. Insofar as each series is itself constituted by differences, the communication that takes place between the two heterogeneous series is a difference relating differences, a second-order difference, which Deleuze calls the differenciator, in that these differences relate, and in so relating, they differenciate first-order differences. This relation takes place through what Deleuze calls the dark precursor, comparing it to the negative path cleared for a bolt of lightning. Once this communication is established, the system explodes: “coupling between heterogeneous systems, from which is derived an internal resonance within the system, and from which in turn is derived a forced movement the amplitude of which exceeds that of the basic series themselves.” (Difference and Repetition, 117) The constitution of a series thus results in what we referred to above as the explication of qualities, which are themselves the results of a cancelled difference. Thus, Deleuze claims, the compounding or synthesis of these systems, series, and relations are the introduction of spatio-temporal dynamisms, which are themselves the sources of qualities and extensions.

The whole of being, ultimately, is a system, connected by way of these differential relations—difference relating to difference through difference—the very nature of Deleuze’s disjunctive synthesis. Difference in itself teems with vitality and life. As systems differentiate, their differences ramify throughout the system, and in so doing, series form new series, and new systems, de-enlisting and redistributing the singular points of interest and their constitutive and corresponding nomadic relations, which are themselves implicating, and, conversely, explicated in the phenomenal realm. The disjunctive synthesis is the affirmative employment of the creativity brought about by the various plays of differences. Against Leibniz’s notion of compossibility is opposed the affirmation of incompossibility. Leibniz defined the perfection of the cosmos in terms of its compossibility, and this in terms of a maximization of continuity. The disjunctive synthesis brings about the communication and cooperative disharmony of divergent and heterogeneous series; it does not, thereby, cancel the differences between them. Where incompossibility for Leibniz was a means of exclusion—an infinity of possible worlds excluded from reality on the basis of their incompossibility, in the hands of Deleuze, it becomes a means of opening the thing to the possible infinity of events. It is in this sense that Nietzsche’s eternal return is, for Deleuze, the affirmation of the return of the different, and hence, the affirmation, all of chance, all at once.

Finally, the eternal return is the name that Deleuze gives to the pulsating-contracting temporality according to which the pure spatium or depth differenciates. In Chapter 2 of Difference and Repetition, Deleuze employs the Husserlian discussion of the living present. However, unlike Derrida, Deleuze will simply discard Husserl’s notion of the primal impression—this term never makes an appearance in Difference and Repetition. Deleuze will argue that, with respect to time, the present is all there is, but the present itself is nothing more than the relation of retention to protention. If the present were truly present, (in the sense of a self-contained kernel of time, like Husserl’s primal impression), then, just as Aristotle noted, the present could never pass, because in order to pass, it would have to pass within another moment. The present can only pass, Deleuze claims, because the past is already in the present, reaching through the present, into the future, drawing the future into itself. Time, in other words, is nothing more than the contraction of past and future. The present, therefore, is the beating heart of difference in itself, but it is a present constituted on the basis of a differentiation.

Deleuze is therefore a differential ontologist in that he attempts to formulate a notion of difference that is: (1) The constitutive play of forces underlying the constitution of identities; (2) Purely relational, that is, non-negational, and hence, not in any way subordinate to the principle of identity. It is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of identity but in such a way as to not recreate the presuppositions surrounding identity at the level of the conditions themselves—it is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of real experience, the world as it is lived.

4. Conclusion

To briefly sum up, we can say that Derrida and Deleuze are the two key differential ontologists in the history of philosophy. While others before them were indeed thinkers of multiplicity, as opposed to thinkers of identity, none, so rigorously as Derrida and Deleuze, came to the conclusion that what was required in order to truly think multiplicity was an explicit formulation of a concept of difference, in itself. One of the key distinctions between the two of them, which explains many of their other differences, is their respective attitudes towards fidelity to the tradition of philosophy. While Derrida will understand fidelity to the tradition in the sense of embracing the presuppositions and prejudices of the tradition, using them, ultimately, to think beyond the tradition, but in such a way as to speak constantly of the end of metaphysics, and ultimately eschewing the adoption of any traditional philosophical terms such as ontology, being, and so forth; Deleuze, on the contrary, will understand fidelity to the philosophical tradition in the sense of embracing what philosophy has always sought to do, to think the fundamental, and will, in the name of this task, happily discard any presuppositions or prejudices that the tradition has attempted to bestow. So, while Derrida will, for instance, claim that the founding privilege of presence is not up for grabs in philosophy, but will, at the same time, avoid using terms like experience, being, ontology, concept, and so forth, Deleuze will claim that it is precisely the emphasis on presence (in the form of representational concepts and categories) that has kept philosophy from living up to its task. Therefore, the prejudice should be discarded. But that does not mean, Deleuze will argue, that we should give up metaphysics. If the old metaphysics no longer works, throw it out, and build a new one, from the ground up, if need be, but a new metaphysics, all the same.

5. References and Further Reading

The following is an annotated list of the key sources in which the differential ontologies of Derrida and Deleuze are formulated.

a. Primary Sources

  • Deleuze, Gilles. Bergsonism. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. New York: Zone Books, 1988.
    • Henri Bergson was a French “celebrity” philosopher in the early twentieth century, whose philosophy had very much fallen out of favor in France by the mid to late 1920s, as Husserlian phenomenology began to work its way into Paris. Deleuze’s 1966 text on Bergson played no small part in bringing Bergson back into fashion. In this text, Deleuze analyzes the Bergsonian notions of durée, memory, and élan vital, demonstrating the consistent trajectory of Bergson’s work from beginning to end, and highlighting the centrality of Bergson’s notion of time for the entirety of Deleuze’s thought.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Desert Islands and Other Texts (1953-1974). Ed. David Lapoujade, Trans. Michael Taormina. Los Angeles and New York: Semiotext(e), 2004.
    • This text contains many of Deleuze’s most important essays from his philosophically “formative” years. It contains his 1954 review of Jean Hyppolite’s Logic and Existence, as well as very early essays on Bergson. In addition, it contains interviews and round-table discussions surrounding the period leading up to and following the 1968 release of Difference and Repetition.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Difference and Repetition. Translated by Paul Patton. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
    • This is without question the most important book Deleuze ever wrote. It was his principal thesis for the Doctorat D’Etat in 1968, and it is in this text that the various elements that had emerged from his book-length engagements with other philosophers over the years come together into the critique of representation and the formulation of a differential ontology.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza. Translated by Martin Joughin. New York: Zone Books, 1992.
    • This book was his secondary, historical thesis in 1968, though there is good evidence that the book was actually first drafted in 1961-62, around the same time as the book on Nietzsche. The concept of expression, here analyzed in Spinoza, plays a very important role for Deleuze, and it is Spinoza who provides an alternative ontology of immanence which, contrary to that of Hegel, (quite prominent in mid-1960s France), does not rely upon the movement of negation, a concept that, for Deleuze, does not belong in the domain of ontology. As we saw in the article, Being is itself creative, and hence an object of affirmation, and to make negation an integral element in one’s ontology is, for Deleuze, antithetical to affirmation. Deleuze emphasizes expression, rather than negation. This emphasis already plays a role in the 1954 Review of Hyppolite (mentioned above).
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Kant’s Critical Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984.
    • In this 1963 text, Deleuze looks at the philosophy of Immanuel Kant, through the lens of the third CritiqueThe Critique of Judgment, arguing that Kant, (thanks in large part to Salomon Maimon) recognized the problems in the first two Critiques, and began attempting to correct them at the end of his life. In this text Deleuze examines Kant’s notion of the faculties, highlighting that by the time of the third Critique, (and unlike its two predecessors), the faculties are in a discordant accord—none legislating over the others.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. The Logic of Sense. Translated by Mark Lester with Charles Stivale. Edited by Constantin V. Boundas. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1990.
    • This text is interesting for a number of reasons. First, published in 1969, just one year following Difference and Repetition, it explores many of the same themes of Difference and Repetition, such as becomingtimeeternal returnsingularities, and so forth. At the same time, other themes, such as the event become centrally important, and these themes are now explored through the notion of sense. In a way it is in part a reorientation of Difference and Repetition. But one of the most important points to note is that the notion of the fractal subject is brought into conversation with psychoanalytic theory, and thus, this text forms a bridge between Deleuze’s earlier philosophical works and his political works with Félix Guattari, the first of which, Anti-Oedipus, was released just three years later, in 1972. In addition, the appendices in this volume include important essays on the reversal of Platonism, on the Stoics, and on Pierre Klossowski.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Nietzsche and Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1983.
    • This book, from 1962, was Deleuze’s second book. It may be a stretch to say that this book is the second most important book in Deleuze’s corpus. Nevertheless, it is certainly high on the list of importance. Here we see in their formational expressions, some of the motifs that will dominate all of Deleuze’s works up through The Logic of Sense. Among them are the rejection of negation, the articulation of the eternal return, the incompleteness of the Kantian critique, the purely relational ontology of force, which is the will to power, and so forth. This book lays out in very raw and accessible, (if somewhat underdeveloped) form some of the most significant criticisms later developed in Difference and Repetition.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Dissemination. Translated by Barbara Johnson. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This text was published in 1972, (along with Positions and Margins of Philosophy) as part of Derrida’s second publication blitz, (the first being in 1967). In addition to the titular essay, it contains the very important essay on Plato, “Plato’s Pharmacy.” Like much of what Derrida wrote, this text is extremely difficult, and probably not a good starter text for Derrida. Nonetheless, it’s one of his more important books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Edmund Husserl’s Origin of Geometry: An Introduction. Lincoln, Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press, 1989.
    • In 1962, Derrida translated an essay from very late in Husserl’s career, “The Origin of Geometry.” He also wrote a translator’s introduction to the essay—Husserl’s essay is about 18 pages long, while Derrida’s introduction is about 150 pages in length. This essay is of particular interest because it deals with the problem of how the ideal is constituted in the sphere of the subject; this will be a problem that will occupy Derrida up through the period of Voice and Phenomenon and beyond.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Margins of Philosophy. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1982.
    • This book is a collection of essays from the late-1960s up through the early 1970s, and is another from the 1972 publication blitz. It is very important for numerous reasons, but in no small part because it is here that his engagement with the work of Martin Heidegger, (which will occupy him throughout the remainder of his career), robustly begins. It contains some of the most important essays from Derrida’s mature work. Among them are the famous “Différance” essay, “The Ends of Man,” “Ousia and Grammē: Note on a Note from Being and Time,” “White Mythology,” (on the essential metaphoricity of language), and “Signature Event Context,” known for spawning the famous debate with John Searle over the work of J.L. Austin.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Of Grammatology. Translated by Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak. Baltimore and London: The JohnsHopkinsUniversity Press, 1974.
    • This book is one from the 1967 publication blitz, and is probably Derrida’s most famous work, among philosophers and non-philosophers alike. In addition, it is really one of the only book-length pieces Derrida wrote that is (at least the first part), merely programmatic and expository, as opposed to the prolonged engagements he typically undertakes with a particular text or thinker (the second part of the book is such an engagement, primarily with the thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau). In this book we get extended discussions of the history of metaphysics, logocentrism, the privilege of voice over writing in the tradition, différance, trace, and supplementarity. It is also in this text that the infamous quote, “There is no outside-text,” is found.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Positions. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This book is from the 1972 group, and is a very short collection of interviews. It is highly recommended as a good starting-point for those approaching Derrida for the first time. Here Derrida lays out in very straightforward, programmatic terms, the stakes of the deconstructive project, unencumbered by deep textual analysis.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Voice and Phenomenon. Trans. Leonard Lawlor. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2011.
    • This is probably the single most important book that Derrida wrote. It is, like most of the rest of his work, a textual engagement with Husserl. Nevertheless, Derrida concentrates on a few key passages of Husserl’s works, most of which are cited in the body of Derrida’s work, such that a very basic knowledge of the Husserlian project makes reading Derrida’s text quite possible. It is in his engagement with Husserl, and the deconstruction of consciousness, that Derrida formulates the key concepts of différancetrace, and supplementarity, that will govern the direction of his work for most of the rest of his career. Derrida himself claims (in Positions) that this is his favorite of his books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Writing and Difference. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1978.
    • This book is from the 1967 publication blitz, and it is a collection of Derrida’s early essays up through the mid-1960s. Here we get a very important essay on Michel Foucault that spawned the bitter fallout between the two for many years, the essay on Emmanuel Levinas that reoriented Levinas’ thinking, as well as demonstrated the broad and deep knowledge that Derrida had of the phenomenological tradition. In addition, this essay, “Violence and Metaphysics,” highlights the important role that Levinas will play in Derrida’s own thinking. There is also a very important essay on Freud and the trace, which is contemporaneous with the writing of Voice and Phenomenon.

b. Secondary Sources

There are many terrific volumes of secondary material on these two thinkers, but here are selected a few of the most relevant with respect to the themes explored in this article.

  • Bell, Jeffrey A. Philosophy at the Edge of Chaos. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2006.
  • Bell, Jeffrey A. The Problem of Difference: Phenomenology and Poststructuralism. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1998.
    • Both of Bell’s books deal with the question of difference, and situate, primarily Deleuze but Derrida as well, within the larger context of the history of philosophical attempts to think about difference, including Plato, Aristotle, Whitehead, Descartes, and Kant.
  • Bogue, Ronald. Deleuze and Guattari. London and New York: Routledge, 1989.
    • Bogue’s text was one of the earlier attempts to write a comprehensive introductory text that took into account Deleuze’s historical engagements, along with his own philosophical articulations of his concepts, and the later political and aesthetic texts as well. This text is still a ‘standard’.
  • Bryant, Levi. Difference and Givenness: Deleuze’s Transcendental Empiricism and the Ontology of Immanence. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2008.
    • Bryant’s is one of the best books on Deleuze in recent years. It focuses primarily on Difference and Repetition, but examines the concept of transcendental empiricism, what it means to attempt to think the conditions of real experience, through the lens of Deleuze’s previous interactions with the thinkers who informed the research of Difference and Repetition.
  • De Beistigui, Miguel. Truth and Genesis: Philosophy as Differential Ontology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2004.
    • De Beistigui, whose early works centered on the philosophy of Martin Heidegger, argues in this book that Deleuze completes the Heideggerian attempt to think difference, in that it is Deleuze who overcomes the humanism that Heidegger never quite escapes.
  • Descombes, Vincent. Modern French Philosophy. Trans. L. Scott-Fox and J.M. Harding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
    • Descombes’ book was one of the first to attempt to capture the heart of French philosophy in the wake of Bergson. It is still one of the best, especially given its brevity. Chapters 5 and 6 are particularly relevant.
  • Gasché, Rodolphe. The Tain of the Mirror: Derrida and the Philosophy of Reflection. Cambridge and London: HarvardUniversity Press, 1986.
    • Gasché’s text was one of the earliest and most forceful attempts to situate Derrida’s thinking in the context of an explicit philosophical problem, the problem of critical reflection, complete with a long philosophical history. In the Anglophone world, Derrida’s work was at this time explored mostly in the context of Literary Theory departments. While that gave Derrida something of a ‘head start’ over the reception of Deleuze in the United States, it also created the unfortunate impression, throughout academic philosophy, that Derrida’s project was one of merely ‘playing’ with canonical texts. Gasché’s book corrected that misconception, and to this day it remains one of the best texts for understanding the overall thrust of Derrida’s project.
  • Hägglund, Martin. Radical Atheism: Derrida and the Time of Life. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2008.
    • Hägglund’s book enters into the oft-discussed theme of Derrida’s so-called religious turn in his later period. It is one of the best recent books on Derrida’s thinking, taking up the implications of a fully immanent analysis of temporality.
  • Hughes, Joe. Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation. London: Continuum International Publishing Group, 2008.
    • This book is one of the first to take up a close comparison of Deleuze with the philosophy of Husserl, boldly arguing that Deleuze’s project is marked from start to finish with a certain phenomenological impetus.
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomenology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2002.
    • Lawlor was one of the first American scholars to emphasize the centrality of Husserl to Derrida’s work. This book is particularly helpful because, inasmuch as it deals with the entirety of Derrida’s engagement with Husserl (from 1953 up through Voice and Phenomenon and beyond), it provides a rigorous but accessible explication of the early formation of Derrida’s project. It is without question one of the best books on Derrida available.
  • Marrati, Paola. Genesis and Trace: Derrida Reading Husserl and Heidegger. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2005.
    • This book, first published in French in 1998, explores the origins of the deconstructive project in Derrida’s engagement with the phenomenological tradition, and more specifically, with the question of time. It demonstrates and articulates the lasting significance of the Husserlian problematic up through Derrida’s immersion into Heidegger’s thought, and beyond.
  • Smith, Daniel W. Essays on Deleuze. Edinburgh: EdinburghUniversity Press, 2012.
    • Smith has for years been one of the leading voices in the world when it comes to Deleuze, and this 2012 volume at last collects all of his most important essays on Deleuze, along with a few new ones. Of particular interest is the essay on the simulacrum, the one on univocity, the one on the conditions of the new, and the comparative essay on Deleuze and Derrida.

c. Other Sources Cited in this Article

  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 1. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 2. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Duns Scotus. Philosophical Writings—A Selection. Trans. Allan B. Wolter. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1987.
  • Heraclitus. Fragments: A Text and Translation with a Commentary By T.M. Robinson. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1987.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy. Trans. David Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, First Book. Trans. F. Kersten. Dordrecht, Boston, and London: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1998.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Logical Investigations Volume I. Ed. Dermot Moran. Trans. J.N. Findlay. New York: Routledge, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917). Trans. John Barnett Brough. Dordrecht, Boston, and London: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
  • Hyppolite, Jean. Logic and Existence. Trans. Leonard Lawlor and Amit Sen. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Parmenides. Fragments: A Text and Translation with an Introduction By David Gallop. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1984.
  • Plato. Complete Works. Ed. John M. Cooper. Associate Ed. D.S. Hutchinson. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
  • Spinoza. Complete Works. Ed. Michael L. Morgan. Trans. Samuel Shirley. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2002.


Author Information

Vernon W. Cisney
Gettysburg College
U. S. A.

Michel Foucault: Political Thought

The work of twentieth-century French philosopher Michel Foucault has increasingly influenced the study of politics. This influence has mainly been via concepts he developed in particular historical studies that have been taken up as analytical tools; “governmentality” and ”biopower” are the most prominent of these. More broadly, Foucault developed a radical new conception of social power as forming strategies embodying intentions of their own, above those of individuals engaged in them; individuals for Foucault are as much products of as participants in games of power.

The question of Foucault’s overall political stance remains hotly contested. Scholars disagree both on the level of consistency of his position over his career, and the particular position he could be said to have taken at any particular time. This dispute is common both to scholars critical of Foucault and to those who are sympathetic to his thought.

What can be generally agreed about Foucault is that he had a radically new approach to political questions, and that novel accounts of power and subjectivity were at its heart. Critics dispute not so much the novelty of his views as their coherence. Some critics see Foucault as effectively belonging to the political right because of his rejection of traditional left-liberal conceptions of freedom and justice. Some of his defenders, by contrast, argue for compatibility between Foucault and liberalism. Other defenders see him either as a left-wing revolutionary thinker, or as going beyond traditional political categories.

To summarize Foucault’s thought from an objective point of view, his political works would all seem to have two things in common: (1) an historical perspective, studying social phenomena in historical contexts, focusing on the way they have changed throughout history; (2) a discursive methodology, with the study of texts, particularly academic texts, being the raw material for his inquiries. As such the general political import of Foucault’s thought across its various turns is to understand how the historical formation of discourses have shaped the political thinking and political institutions we have today.

Foucault’s thought was overtly political during one phase of his career, coinciding exactly with the decade of the 1970s, and corresponding to a methodology he designated “genealogy”. It is during this period that, alongside the study of discourses, he analysed power as such in its historical permutations. Most of this article is devoted to this period of Foucault’s work. Prior to this, during the 1960s, the political content of his thought was relatively muted, and the political implications of that thought are contested. So, this article is divided into thematic sections arranged in order of the chronology of their appearance in Foucault’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Foucault’s Early Marxism
  2. Archaeology
  3. Genealogy
  4. Discipline
  5. Sexuality
  6. Power
  7. Biopower
  8. Governmentality
  9. Ethics
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary
    2. Secondary

1. Foucault’s Early Marxism

Foucault began his career as a Marxist, having been influenced by his mentor, the Marxist philosopher Louis Althusser, as a student to join the French Communist Party. Though his membership was tenuous and brief, Foucault’s later political thought should be understood against this background, as a thought that is both under the influence of, and intended as a reaction to, Marxism.

Foucault himself tells us that after his early experience of a Stalinist communist party, he felt sick of politics, and shied away from political involvements for a long time. Still, in his first book, which appeared in 1954, less than two years after Foucault had left the Party, his theoretical perspective remained Marxist. This book was a history of psychology, published in English as Mental Illness and Psychology. In the original text, Foucault concludes that mental illness is a result of alienation caused by capitalism. However, he excised this Marxist content from a later edition in 1962, before suppressing publication of the book entirely; an English translation of the 1962 edition continues to be available only by an accident of copyright (MIP vii). Thus, one can see a trajectory of Foucault’s decisively away from Marxism and indeed tendentially away from politics.

2. Archaeology

Foucault’s first major, canonical work was his 1961 doctoral dissertation, The History of Madness. He gives here a historical account, repeated in brief in the 1962 edition of Mental Illness and Psychology, of what he calls the constitution of an experience of madness in Europe, from the fifteenth to the nineteenth centuries. This encompasses correlative study of institutional and discursive changes in the treatment of the mad, to understand the way that madness was constituted as a phenomenon. The History of Madness is Foucault’s longest book by some margin, and contains a wealth of material that he expands on in various ways in much of his work of the following two decades. Its historical inquiry into the interrelation of institutions and discourses set the pattern for his political works of the 1970s.

Foucault saw there as being three major shifts in the treatment of madness in the period under discussion. The first, with the Renaissance, saw a new respect for madness. Previously, madness had been seen as an alien force to be expelled, but now madness was seen as a form of wisdom. This abruptly changed with the beginning of the Enlightenment in the seventeenth century. Now rationality was valorized above all else, and its opposite, madness, was excluded completely. The unreasonable was excluded from discourse, and congenitally unreasonable people were physically removed from society and confined in asylums. This lasted until the end of the eighteenth century, when a new movement “liberating” the mad arose. For Foucault, however, this was no true liberation, but rather the attempt by Enlightenment reasoning to finally negate madness by understanding it completely, and cure it with medicine.

The History of Madness thus takes seriously the connection between philosophical discourse and political reality. Ideas about reason are not merely taken to be abstract concerns, but as having very real social implications, affecting every facet of the lives of thousands upon thousands of people who were considered mad, and indeed, thereby, altering the structure of society. Such a perspective represents a change in respect of Foucault’s former Marxism. Rather than attempt to ground experience in material circumstances, here it might seem that cultural transformation is being blamed for the transformation of society. That is, it might seem that Foucault had embraced idealism, the position that ideas are the motor force of history, Marxism’s opposite. This would, however, be a misreading. The History of Madness posits no causal priority, either of the cultural shift over the institutional, or vice versa. It simply notes the coincident transformation, without etiological speculation. Moreover, while the political forces at work in the history of madness were not examined by Foucault in this work, it is clearly a political book, exploring the political stakes of philosophy and medicine.

Many were convinced that Foucault was an idealist, however, by later developments in his thought. After The History of Madness, Foucault began to focus on the discursive, bracketing political concerns almost entirely. This was first, and most clearly, signalled in the preface to his next book, The Birth of the Clinic. Although the book itself essentially extends The History of Madness chronologically and thematically, by examining the birth of institutional medicine from the end of the eighteenth century, the preface is a manifesto for a new methodology that will attend only to discourses themselves, to the language that is uttered, rather than the institutional context. It is the following book in Foucault’s sequence, rather than The Birth of the Clinic itself, that carried this intention to fulfilment: this book was The Order of Things (1966). Whereas in The History of Madness and The Birth of the Clinic, Foucault had pursued historical researches that had been relatively balanced between studying conventional historical events, institutional change, and the history of ideas, The Order of Things represented an abstract history of thought that ignored almost anything outside the discursive. This method was in effect what was at that time in France called “structuralism,” though Foucault was never happy with this use of this term. His specific claims were indeed quite unique, namely that in the history of academic discourses, in a given epoch, knowledge is organized by an episteme, which governs what kind of statements can be taken as true. The Order of Things charts several successive historical shifts of episteme in relation to the human sciences.

These claims led Foucault onto a collision with French Marxism. This could not have been entirely unintended by Foucault, in particular because in the book he specifically accuses Marxism of being a creature of the nineteenth century that was now obsolete. He also concluded the work by indicating his opposition to humanism, declaring that “man” (the gendered “man” here refers to a concept that in English we have come increasingly to call the “human”) as such was perhaps nearing obsolescence. Foucault here was opposing a particular conception of the human being as a sovereign subject who can understand itself. Such humanism was at that time the orthodoxy in French Marxism and philosophy, championed the pre-eminent philosopher of the day, Jean-Paul Sartre, and upheld by the French Communist Party’s central committee explicitly against Althusser just a month before The Order of Things was published (DE1 36). In its humanist form, Marxism cast itself as a movement for the full realization of the individual. Foucault, by contrast, saw the notion of the individual as a recent and aberrant idea. Furthermore, his entire presumption to analyse and criticize discourses without reference to the social and economic system that produced them seemed to Marxists to be a massive step backwards in analysis. The book indeed seems to be apolitical: it refuses to take a normative position about truth, and accords no importance to anything outside abstract, academic discourses. The Order of Things proved so controversial, its claims so striking, that it became a best-seller in France, despite being a lengthy, ponderous, scholarly tome.

Yet, Foucault’s position is not quite as anti-political as has been imagined. The explicit criticism of Marxism in the book was specifically of Marx’s economic doctrine: it amounts to the claim that this economics is essentially a form of nineteenth century political economy. It is thus not a total rejection of Marxism, or dismissal of the importance of economics. His anti-humanist position was not in itself anti-Marxist, inasmuch as Althusser took much the same line within a Marxist framework, albeit one that tended to challenge basic tenets of Marxism, and which was rejected by the Marxist establishment. This shows it is possible to use the criticism of the category of “man” in a pointedly political way. Lastly, the point of Foucault’s “archaeological” method of investigation, as he now called it, of looking at transformations of discourses in their own terms without reference to the extra-discursive, does not imply in itself that discursive transformations can be explained without reference to anything non-discursive, only that they can be mapped without any such reference. Foucault thus shows a lack of interest in the political, but no outright denial of the importance of politics.

Foucault was at this time fundamentally oriented towards the study of language. This should not in itself be construed as apolitical. There was a widespread intellectual tendency in France during the 1960s to focus on avant-garde literature as being the main repository for radical hopes, eclipsing a traditional emphasis on the politics of the working class. Foucault wrote widely during this period on art and literature, publishing a book on the obscure French author Raymond Roussel, which appeared on the same day as The Birth of the Clinic. Given Roussel’s eccentricity, this was not far from his reflections on literature in The History of Madness. For Foucault, modern art and literature are essentially transgressive. Transgression is something of a common thread running through Foucault’s work in the 1960s: the transgression of madness and literary modernism is for Foucault directly implicated in the challenge he sees emerging to the current episteme. This interest in literature culminated in what is perhaps Foucault’s best known piece in this relation, ”What Is an Author?”, which combines some of the themes from his final book of the sixties, The Archaeology of Knowledge, with reflections on modern literature in challenging the notion of the human “author” of a work in whatever genre. All of these works, no matter how abstract, can be seen as having important political-cultural stakes for Foucault. Challenging the suzerainty of “man” can in itself be said to have constituted his political project during this period, such was the importance he accorded to discourses. The practical importance of such questions can be seen in The History of Madness.

Foucault was ultimately dissatisfied with this approach, however. The Archaeology of Knowledge, a reflective consideration of the methodology of archaeology itself, ends with an extraordinary self-critical dialogue, in which Foucault answers imagined objections to this methodology.

3. Genealogy

Foucault wrote The Archaeology of Knowledge while based in Tunisia, where he had taken a three-year university appointment in 1966. While the book was in its final stages, the world around him changed. Tunisia went through a political upheaval, with demonstrations against the government, involving many of his students. He was drawn into supporting them, and was persecuted as a result. Much better known and more significant student demonstrations occurred in Paris shortly afterwards, in May of 1968. Foucault largely missed these because he was in Tunis, but he followed news of them keenly.

He returned to France permanently in 1969. He was made the head of the philosophy department at a brand new university at Vincennes. The milieu he found on his return to France was itself highly politicized, in stark contrast to the relatively staid country he had left behind three years before. He was surrounded by peers who had become committed militants, not least his partner Daniel Defert, and including almost all of the colleagues he had hired to his department. He now threw himself into an activism that would characterize his life from that point on.

It was not long before a new direction appeared in his thought to match. The occasion this first became apparent was his 1970 inaugural address for another new job, his second in as many years, this time as a professor at the Collège de France, the highest academic institution in France. This address was published as a book in France, L’ordre du discours, “The Order of Discourse” (which is one of the multiple titles under which it has been translated in English). For the first time, Foucault sets out an explicit agenda of studying institutions alongside discourse. He had done this in the early 1960s, but now he proposed it as a deliberate method, which he called “genealogy.” Much of “The Order of Discourse” in effect recapitulates Foucault’s thought up to that point, the considerations of the history of madness and the regimes of truth that have governed scientific discourse, leading to a sketch of a mode of analysing discourse similar to that of The Archeology of Knowledge. In the final pages, however, Foucault states that he will now undertake analyses in two different directions, critical and “genealogical.” The critical direction consists in the study of the historical formation of systems of exclusion. This is clearly a turn back to the considerations of The History of Madness. The genealogical direction is more novel – not only within Foucault’s work, but in Western thought in general, though the use of the term “genealogical” does indicate a debt to one who came before him, namely Friedrich Nietzsche. The genealogical inquiry asks about the reciprocal relationship between systems of exclusion and the formation of discourses. The point here is that exclusion is not a fate that befalls innocent, pre-existing discourses. Rather, discourses only ever come about within and because of systems of exclusion, the negative moment of exclusion co-existing with the positive moment of the production of discourse. Now, discourse becomes a political question in a full sense for Foucault, as something that is intertwined with power.

“Power” is barely named as such by Foucault in this text, but it becomes the dominant concept of his output of the 1970s. This output comprises two major books, eight annual lecture series he gave at the Collège de France, and a plethora of shorter pieces and interviews. The signature concept of genealogy, combining the new focus on power with the older one on discourse, is his notion of “power-knowledge.” Foucault now sees power and knowledge as indissolubly joined, such that one never has either one without the other, with neither having causal suzerainty over the other.

His first lecture series at the Collège de France, now published in French as Leçons sur la volonté de savoir (“Lessons on the will to knowledge”), extends the concerns of “The Order of Discourse” with the production of knowledge. More overtly political material followed in the next two lecture series, between 1971 and 1973, both of which dealt with the prison system, and led up to Foucault’s first full-scale, published genealogy, 1975’s Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison.

4. Discipline

This research on prisons began in activism. The French state had banned several radical leftist groups in the aftermath of May 1968, and thousands of their members ended up in prisons, where they began to agitate for political rights for themselves, then began to agitate for rights for prisoners in general, having been exposed by their incarceration to ordinary prisoners and their problems. Foucault was the main organizer of a group formed outside the prison, in effect as an outgrowth of this struggle, the Groupe d’informations sur les prisons (the GIP – the Prisons Information Group). This group, composed primarily of intellectuals, sought simply to empower prisoners to speak of their experiences on their own account, by sending surveys out to them and collating their responses.

In tandem with this effort, Foucault researched the history of the prisons, aiming to find out something that the prisoners themselves could not tell him: how the prison system had come into being and what purpose it served in the broader social context. His history of the prisons turns out to be a history of a type of power that Foucault calls “disciplinary,” which encompasses the modern prison system, but is much broader. Discipline and Punish thus comprises two main historical theses. One, specifically pertaining to the prison system, is that this system regularly produces an empirically well-known effect, a layer of specialized criminal recidivists. This is for Foucault simply what prisons objectively do. Pointing this out undercuts the pervasive rationale of imprisonment that prisons are there to reduce crime by punishing and rehabilitating inmates. Foucault considers the obvious objection to this that prisons only produce such effects because they have been run ineffectively throughout their history, that better psychological management of rehabilitation is required, in particular. He answers this by pointing out that such discourses of prison reform have accompanied the prison system since it was first established, and are hence part of its functioning, indeed propping it up in spite of its failures by providing a constant excuse for its failings by arguing that it can be made to work differently.

Foucault’s broader thesis in Discipline and Punish is that we are living in a disciplinary society, of which the prison is merely a potent example. Discipline began not with the prisons, but originally in monastic institutions, spreading out through society via the establishment of professional armies, which required dressage, the training of individual soldiers in their movements so that they could coordinate with one another with precision. This, crucially, was a matter of producing what Foucault calls “docile bodies,” the basic unit of disciplinary power. The prison is just one of a raft of broadly similar disciplinary institutions that come into existence later. Schools, hospitals, and factories all combine similar methods to prisons for arranging bodies regularly in space, down to their minute movements. All combine moreover similar functions. Like the prison, they all have educational, economically productive, and medical aspects to them. The differences between these institutions is a matter of which aspect has primacy.

All disciplinary institutions also do something else that is quite novel, for Foucault: they produce a “soul” on the basis of the body, in order to imprison the body. This eccentric formulation of Foucault’s is meant to capture the way that disciplinary power has increasingly individualized people. Discipline and Punish begins with a vivid depiction of an earlier form of power in France, specifically the execution in 1757 of a man who had attempted to kill the King of France. As was the custom, for this, the most heinous of crimes in a political system focused on the person of the king, the most severe punishment was meted out: the culprit was publicly tortured to death. Foucault contrasts this with the routinized imprisonment that became the primary form of punishing criminals in the 19th century. From a form of power that punished by extraordinary and exemplary physical harm against a few transgressors, Western societies adopted a form of power that attempted to capture all individual behaviour. This is illustrated by a particular example that has become one of the best known images from Foucault’s work, the influential scheme of nineteenth century philosopher Jeremy Bentham called the “Panopticon,” a prison in which every action of the inmates would be visible. This serves as something of a paradigm for the disciplinary imperative, though it was never realized completely in practice.

Systems of monitoring and control nevertheless spread through all social institutions: schools, workplaces, and the family. While criminals had in a sense already been punished individually, they were not treated as individuals in the full sense that now developed. Disciplinary institutions such as prisons seek to develop detailed individual psychological profiles of people, and seek to alter their behaviour at the same level. Where previously most people had been part of a relatively undifferentiated mass, individuality being the preserve of a prominent or notorious few, and even then a relatively thin individuality, a society of individuals now developed, where everyone is supposed to have their own individual life story. This constitutes the soul Foucault refers to.

5. Sexuality

The thread of individualization runs through his next book, the first of what were ultimately three volumes of his History of Sexuality. He gave this volume the title The Will to Knowledge. It appeared only a year after Discipline and Punish. Still, three courses at the Collège de France intervene between his lectures on matters penitential and the book on sexuality. The first, Psychiatric Power, picks up chronologically where The History of Madness had left off, and applies Foucault’s genealogical method to the history of psychiatry. The next year, 1975, Foucault gave a series of lectures entitled Abnormal. These link together the studies on the prison with those on psychiatry and the question of sexuality through the study of the category of the abnormal, to which criminals, the mad, and sexual “perverts” were all assigned. Parts of these lectures indeed effectively reappear in The Will to Knowledge.

Like Discipline and Punish, the Will to Knowledge contains both general and specific conclusions. Regarding the specific problem of sexuality, Foucault couches his thesis as a debunking of a certain received wisdom in relation to the history of sexuality that he calls “the repressive hypothesis.” This is the view that our sexuality has historically been repressed, particularly in the nineteenth century, but that during the twentieth century it has been progressively liberated, and that we need now to get rid of our remaining hang-ups about sex by talking openly and copiously about it. Foucault allows the core historical claim that there has been sexual repressiveness, but thinks that this is relatively unimportant in the history of sexuality. Much more important, he thinks, is an injunction to talk about our sexuality that has consistently been imposed even during the years of repressiveness, and is now intensified, ostensibly for the purpose of lifting our repression. Foucault again sees a disciplinary technique at work, namely confession. This began in the Catholic confessional, with the Church spreading the confessional impulse in relation to sex throughout society in the early modern period. Foucault thinks this impulse has since been made secular, particularly under the auspices of institutional psychiatry, introducing a general compulsion for everyone to tell the truth about themselves, with their sexuality a particular focus. For Foucault, there is no such thing as sexuality apart from this compulsion. That is, sexuality itself is not something that we naturally have, but rather something that has been invented and imposed.

The implication of his genealogy of sexuality is that “sex” as we understand it is an artificial construct within this recent “device” (dispositif) of sexuality. This includes both the category of the sexual, encompassing certain organs and acts, and “sex” in the sense of gender, an implication spelt out by Foucault in his introduction to the memoirs of Herculine Barbin, a nineteenth century French hermaphrodite, which Foucault discovered and arranged to have published. Foucault’s thought, and his work on sexuality in particular, has been immensely influential in the recent “third wave” of feminist thought. The interaction of Foucault and feminism is the topic of a dedicated article elsewhere in this encyclopedia.

6. Power

The most general claim of The Will to Knowledge, and of Foucault’s entire political thought, is his answer to the question of where machinations such as sex and discipline come from. Who and what is it that is responsible for the production of criminality via imprisonment? Foucault’s answer is, in a word, “power.” That is to say that no one in particular is producing these things, but that rather they are effects generated by the interaction of power relations, which produce intentions of their own, not necessarily shared by any individuals or institutions. Foucault’s account of power is the broadest of the conclusions of The Will to Knowledge. Although similar reflections on power can be found in Discipline and Punish and in lectures and interviews of the same period, The Will to Knowledge gives his most comprehensive account of power. Foucault understands power in terms of “strategies” which are produced through the concatenation of the power relations that exist throughout society, wherever people interact. As he explains in a later text, “The Subject and Power,” which effectively completes the account of power given in The Will to Knowledge, these relations are a matter of people acting on one another to make other people act in turn. Whenever we try to influence others, this is power. However, our attempts to influence others rarely turn out the way we expect; moreover, even when they do, we have very little idea what effects our actions on others’ have more broadly. In this way, the social effects of our attempts to influence other people run quite outside of our control or ken. This effect is neatly encapsulated in a remark attributed to Foucault that we may know what we do, but we do not know what what we do does. What it does is produce strategies that have a kind of life of their own. Thus, although no one in the prison system, neither the inmates, nor the guards, nor politicians, want prisons to produce a class of criminals, this is nonetheless what the actions of all the people involved do.

Controversy around Foucault’s political views has focused on his reconception of power. Criticisms of him on this point invariably fail, however, to appreciate his true position or beg the question against it by simply restating the views he has rejected. He has been interpreted as thinking that power is a mysterious, autonomous force that exists independently of any human influence, and is so all-encompassing as to preclude any resistance to it. Foucault clearly states in The Will to Knowledge that this is not so, though it is admittedly relatively difficult to understand his position, namely that resistance to power is not outside power. The point here for Foucault is not that resistance is futile, but that power is so ubiquitous that in itself it is not an obstacle to resistance. One cannot resist power as such, but only specific strategies of power, and then only with great difficulty, given the tendency of strategies to absorb apparently contradictory tendencies. Still, for Foucault power is never conceived as monolithic or autonomous, but rather is a matter of superficially stable structures emerging on the basis of constantly shifting relations underneath, caused by an unending struggle between people. Foucault explains this in terms of the inversion of Clausewitz’s dictum that war is diplomacy by other means into the claim that “politics is war by other means.” For Foucault, apparently peaceful and civilized social arrangements are supported by people locked in a struggle for supremacy, which is eternally susceptible to change, via the force of that struggle itself.

Foucault is nevertheless condemned by many liberal commentators for his failure to make any normative distinction between power and resistance, that is, for his relativism. This accusation is well founded: he consistently eschews any kind of overtly normative stance in his thought. He thus does not normatively justify resistance, but it is not clear there is any inherent contradiction in a non-normative resistance. This idea is coherent, though of course those who think it is impossible to have a non-normative political thought (which is a consensus position within political philosophy) will reject him on this basis. For his part, he offers only analyses that he hopes will prove useful to people struggling in concrete situations, rather than prescriptions as to what is right or wrong.

One last accusation, coming from a particularly noteworthy source, the most prominent living German philosopher, Jürgen Habermas, should also be mentioned. This accusation is namely that Foucault’s account of power is “functionalist.” Functionalism in sociology means taking society as a functional whole and thus reading every part as having distinct functions. The problem with this view is that society is not designed by anyone and consequently much of it is functionally redundant or accidental. Foucault does use the vocabulary of “function” on occasion in his descriptions of the operations of power, but does not show any allegiance to or even awareness of functionalism as a school of thought. His position in any case is not that society constitutes a totality or whole via any necessity: functions exist within strategies that emerge spontaneously from below, and the functions of any element are subject to change.

7. Biopower

Foucault’s position in relation to resistance implies not so much that one is defeated before one begins as that one must proceed with caution to avoid simply supporting a strategy of power while thinking oneself rebellious. This is for him what has happened in respect of sexuality in the case of the repressive hypothesis. Though we try to liberate ourselves from sexual repression, we in fact play into a strategy of power which we do not realize exists. This strategy is for everyone to constitute themselves as “‘subjects’ in both senses of the word,” a process Foucault designates “subjection” (assujettissement). The two senses here are passive and active. On the one hand, we are subjected in this process, made into passive subjects of study by medical professionals, for example. On the other, we are the subjects in this process, having to actively confess our sexual proclivities and indeed in the process develop an identity based on this confessed sexuality. So, power operates in ways that are both overtly oppressive and more positive.

Sexuality for Foucault has a quite extraordinary importance in the contemporary network of power relations. It has become the essence of our personal identity, and sex has come to be seen as “worth dying for.” Foucault details how sexuality had its beginnings as a preoccupation of the newly dominant bourgeois class, who were obsessed with physical and reproductive health, and their own pleasure. This class produced sexuality positively, though one can see that it would have been imposed on women and children within that class quite regardless of their wishes. For Foucault, there are four consistent strategies of the device of sexuality: the pathologisation of the sexuality of women and children, the concomitant medicalization of the sexually abnormal “pervert,” and the constitution of sexuality as an object of public concern. From its beginning in the bourgeoisie, Foucault sees public health agencies as imposing sexuality more crudely on the rest of the populace, quite against their wishes.

Why has this happened? For Foucault, the main explanation is how sexuality ties together multiple “technologies of power”, namely discipline on the one hand, and a newer technology, which he calls “bio-politics,” on the other. In The Will to Knowledge, Foucault calls this combination of discipline and bio-politics together “bio-power,” though confusingly he elsewhere seems to use “bio-power” and “bio-politics” as synonyms, notably in his 1976 lecture series, Society Must Be Defended. He also elsewhere dispenses with the hyphens in these words, as it will in the present article hereafter.

Biopolitics is a technology of power that grew up on the basis of disciplinary power. Where discipline is about the control of individual bodies, biopolitics is about the control of entire populations. Where discipline constituted individuals as such, biopolitics does this with the population. Prior to the invention of biopolitics, there was no serious attempt by governments to regulate the people who lived in a territory, only piecemeal violent interventions to put down rebellions or levy taxes. As with discipline, the main precursor to biopolitics can be found in the Church, which is the institution that did maintain records of births and deaths, and did minister to the poor and sick, in the medieval period. In the modern period, the perception grew among governments that interventions in the life of the people would produce beneficial consequences for the state, preventing depopulation, ensuring a stable and growing tax base, and providing a regular supply of manpower for the military. Hence they took an active interest in the lives of the people. Disciplinary mechanisms allowed the state to do this through institutions, most notably perhaps medical institutions that allowed the state to monitor and support the health of the population. Sex was the most intense site at which discipline and biopolitics intersected, because any intervention in population via the control of individual bodies fundamentally had to be about reproduction, and also because sex is one of the major vectors of disease transmission. Sex had to be controlled, regulated, and monitored if the population was to be brought under control.

There is another technology of power in play, however, older than discipline, namely “sovereign power.” This is the technology we glimpse at the beginning of Discipline and Punish, one that works essentially by violence and by taking, rather than by positively encouraging and producing as both discipline and biopolitics do. This form of power was previously the way in which governments dealt both with individual bodies and with masses of people. While it has been replaced in these two roles by discipline and biopower, it retains a role nonetheless at the limits of biopower. When discipline breaks down, when the regulation of the population breaks down, the state continues to rely on brute force as a last resort. Moreover, the state continues to rely on brute force, and the threat of it, in dealing with what lies outside its borders.

For Foucault, there is a mutual incompatibility between biopolitics and sovereign power. Indeed, he sometimes refers to sovereign power as “thanatopolitics,” the politics of death, in contrast to biopolitics’s politics of life. Biopolitics is a form of power that works by helping you to live, thanatopolitics by killing you, or at best allowing you to live. It seems impossible for any individual to be simultaneously gripped by both forms of power, notwithstanding a possible conflict between different states or state agencies. There is a need for a dividing line between the two, between who is to be “made to live,” as Foucault puts it, and who is to be killed or simply allowed to go on living indifferently. The most obvious dividing line is the boundary between the population and its outside at the border of a territory, but the “biopolitical border,” as it has been called by recent scholars, is not the same as the territorial border. In Society Must Be Defended, Foucault suggests there is a device he calls “state racism,” that comes variably into play in deciding who is to receive the benefits of biopolitics or be exposed to the risk of death.

Foucault does not use this term in any of the works he published himself, but nevertheless does point in The Will to Knowledge to a close relationship between biopolitics and racism. Discourses of scientific racism that emerged in the nineteenth century posited a link between the sexual “degeneracy” of individuals and the hygiene of the population at large. By the early twentieth century, eugenics, the pseudo-science of improving the vitality of a population through selective breeding, was implemented to some extent in almost all industrialized countries. It of course found its fullest expression in Nazi Germany. Nevertheless, Foucault is quite clear that there is something quite paradoxical about such attempts to link the old theme of “blood” to modern concerns with population health. The essential point about “state racism” is not then that it necessarily links to what we might ordinarily understand as racism in its strict sense, but that there has to be a dividing line in modern biopolitical states between what is part of the population and what is not, and that this is, in a broad sense, racist.

8. Governmentality

After the publication of The Will to Knowledge, Foucault took a one-year hiatus from lecturing at the Collège de France. He returned in 1978 with a series of lectures that followed logically from his 1976 ones, but show a distinct shift in conceptual vocabulary. Talk of “biopolitics” is almost absent. A new concept, “governmentality,” takes its place. The lecture series of 1978 and 1979, Security, Territory, Population and The Birth of Biopolitics, center on this concept, despite the somewhat misleading title of the latter in this regard.

“Governmentality” is a portmanteau word, derived from the phrase “governmental rationality.” A governmentality is thus a logic by which a polity is governed. But this logic is for Foucault, in keeping with his genealogical perspective (which he still affirms), not merely ideal, but rather encompasses institutions, practices and ideas. More specifically, Foucault defines governmentality in Security, Territory, Population as allowing for a complex form of “power which has the population as its target, political economy as its major form of knowledge, and apparatuses of security as its essential technical instrument” (pp. 107–8). Confusingly, however, Foucault in the same breath also defines other senses in which he will use the term “governmentality.” He will use it not only to describe this recent logic of government, but as the longer tendency in Western history that has led to it, and the specific process in the early modern period by which modern governmentality was formed.

“Governmentality” is a slippery concept then. Still, it is an important one. Governmentality seems to be closely contemporaneous and functionally isomorphic with biopolitics, hence seems to replace it in Foucault’s thought. That said, unlike biopolitics, it never figures in a major publication of his – he only allowed one crucial lecture of Security, Territory, Population to be published under the title of “Governmentality,” in an Italian journal. It is via the English translation of this essay that this concept has become known in English, this one essay of Foucault’s in fact inspiring an entire school of sociological reflection.

What is the meaning of this fuzzy concept then? Foucault never repudiates biopower. During these lectures he on multiple occasions reaffirms his interest in biopower as an object of study, and does so as late as 1983, the year before he died. The meaning of governmentality as a concept is to situate biopower in a larger historical moment, one that stretches further back in history and encompasses more elements, in particular the discourses of economics and regulation of the economy.

Foucault details two main phases in the development of governmentality. The first is what he identifies as raison d’État, literally “reason of state.” This is the central object of study of Security, Territory, Population. It correlates the technology of discipline, as an attempt to regulate society to the fullest extent, with what was contemporaneously called “police.” This governmentality gave way by the eighteenth century to a new form of governmentality, what will become political liberalism, which reacts against the failures of governmental regulation with the idea that society should be left to regulate itself naturally, with the power of police applied only negatively in extremis. This for Foucault is broadly the governmentality that has lasted to this day, and is the object of study of The Birth of Biopolitics in its most recent form, what is called “neo-liberalism.” With this governmentality, we see freedom of the individual and regulation of the population subtly intertwined.

9. Ethics

The 1980s see a significant turn in Foucault’s work, both in terms of the discourses he attends to and the vocabulary he uses. Specifically, he focuses from now on mainly on Ancient texts from Greece and Rome, and prominently uses the concepts of “subjectivity” and “ethics.” None of these elements is entirely new to his work, but they assume novel prominence and combination at this point.

There is an article elsewhere in this encyclopedia about Foucault’s ethics. The question here is what the specifically political import of this ethics is. It is often assumed that the meaning of Foucault’s ethics is to retract his earlier political thought and thus to recant on that political project, retreating from political concerns towards a concern with individual action. There is a grain of truth to such allegations, but no more than a grain. While certainly Foucault’s move to the consideration of ethics is a move away from an explicitly political engagement, there is no recantation or contradiction of his previous positions, only the offering of an account of subjectivity and ethics that might enrich these.

Foucault’s turn towards subjectivity is similar to his earlier turn towards power: he seeks to add a dimension to the accounts and approach he has built up. As in the case of power, he does so not by helping himself to an available approach, but by producing a new one: Foucault’s own account of subjectivity is original and quite different to the extant accounts of subjectivity he rejected in his earlier work. Subjectivity for Foucault is a matter of people’s ability to shape their own conduct. In this way, his account relates to his previous work on government, with subjectivity a matter of the government of the self. It is thus closely linked to his political thought, as a question of the power that penetrates the interior of the person.

“Ethics” too is understood in this terms. Foucault does not produce an “ethics” in the sense that the word is conventionally used today to mean a normative morality, nor indeed does he produce a “political philosophy” in the sense that that phrase is conventionally used, which is to say a normative politics. “Ethics” for Foucault is rather understood etymologically by reference to Ancient Greek reflection on the ethike, which is to say, on character. Ancient Greek ethics was marked by what Foucault calls the “care of the self”: it is essentially a practice of fashioning the self. In such practices, Foucault sees a potential basis for resistance to power, though he is clear that no truly ethical practices exist today and it is by no means clear that they can be reestablished. Ethics has, on the contrary, been abnegated by Christianity with its mortificatory attitude to the self. This account of ethics can be found primarily in Foucault’s last three lecture series at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject, The Government of the Self and Others and The Courage of the Truth.

10. References and Further Reading

English translations of works by Foucault named above, in the order they were originally written.

a. Primary

    • Mental illness and psychology. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987.
    • The History of Madness. London: Routledge, 2006.
    • Birth of the Clinic. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • The Order of Things. London: Tavistock, 1970.
    • The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon, 1972.
    • "The order of discourse," in M. Shapiro, ed., Language and politics (Blackwell, 1984), pp. 108-138. Translated by Ian McLeod.
    • Psychiatric Power. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2006.
    • Discipline and Punish. London: Allen Lane, 1977.
    • Abnormal. London: Verso, 2003.
    • Society Must Be Defended. New York: Picador, 2003.
    • An Introduction. Vol. 1 of The History of Sexuality. New York: Pantheon, 1978. Reprinted as The Will to Knowledge, London: Penguin, 1998.
    • Security, Territory, Population. New York: Picador, 2009
    • The Birth of Biopolitics. New York: Picador, 2010
    • "Introduction" M. Foucault, ed., Herculine Barbin: being the recently discovered memoirs of a nineteenth-century French hermaphrodite Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980, pp. vii-xvii. Translated by Richard McDougall.
    • “The Subject and Power,” J. Faubion, ed., Power. New York: New Press, 2000, pp. 326-348.
    • The Hermeneutics of the Subject. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
    • The Government of the Self and Others. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2010.
    • The Courage of the Truth. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2011.

The shorter writings and interviews of Foucault are also of extraordinary interest, particularly to philosophers. In French, these have been published in an almost complete collection, Dits et écrits, by Gallimard, first in four volumes and more recently in a two-volume edition. In English, Foucault’s shorter works are spread across many overlapping anthologies, which even between them omit much that is important. The most important of these anthologies for Foucault’s political thought are:

  • J. Faubion, ed., Power Vol. 3, Essential Works. New York: New Press, 2000.
  • Colin Gordon, ed., Power/Knowledge. Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980.

b. Secondary

  • Graham Burchell, Colin Gordon and Peter Miller (eds.), The Foucault Effect. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1991.
    • An edited collection that is a mixture of primary and secondary sources. Both parts of the book have been extraordinarily influential. If constitutes a decent primer on governmentality.
  • Gilles Deleuze, Foucault. Trans. Seán Hand. London: Athlone, 1988.
    • The best book about Foucault’s work, from one who knew him. Though predictably idiosyncratic, it is still a pointedly political reading.
  • David Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: A Critical Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
    • An excellent selection of critical essays, mostly specifically political.
  • Mark G. E. Kelly, The Political Philosophy of Michel Foucault. New York: Routledge, 2009.
    • A comprehensive treatment of Foucault’s political thought from a specifically philosophical angle
  • John Rajchman, Michel Foucault: The Freedom of Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An idiosyncratic reading of Foucault that is particularly good at synthesising his entire career according to the political animus behind it.
  • Jon Simons, Foucault and the Political. London: Routledge, 1995.
    • The first work to focus on Foucault’s thought from a political introduction, this survey of his work serves well as a general introduction to the topic, though it necessarily lacks consideration of much that has appeared in English since its publication.
  • Barry Smart (ed.), Michel Foucault: Critical Assessments (multi-volume). London: Routledge, 1995.
    • Includes multiple sections on Foucault’s political thought.

Author Information

Mark Kelly
Middlesex University
United Kingdom


By its broadest definition, the term ‘Neo-Kantianism’ names any thinker after Kant who both engages substantively with the basic ramifications of his transcendental idealism and casts their own project at least roughly within his terminological framework. In this sense, thinkers as diverse as Schopenhauer, Mach, Husserl, Foucault, Strawson, Kuhn, Sellers, Nancy, Korsgaard, and Friedman could loosely be considered Neo-Kantian. More specifically, ‘Neo-Kantianism’ refers to two multifaceted and internally-differentiated trends of thinking in the late Nineteenth and early Twentieth-Centuries: the Marburg School and what is usually called either the Baden School or the Southwest School. The most prominent representatives of the former movement are Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, and Ernst Cassirer. Among the latter movement are Wilhelm Windelband and Heinrich Rickert. Several other noteworthy thinkers are associated with the movement as well.

Neo-Kantianism was the dominant philosophical movement in German universities from the 1870's until the First World War. Its popularity declined rapidly thereafter even though its influences can be found on both sides of the Continental/Analytic divide throughout the twentieth century. Sometimes unfairly cast as narrowly epistemological, Neo-Kantianism covered a broad range of themes, from logic to the philosophy of history, ethics, aesthetics, psychology, religion, and culture. Since then there has been a relatively small but philosophically serious effort to reinvigorate further historical study and programmatic advancement of this often neglected philosophy.

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