Category Archives: American Philosophy

American Enlightenment Thought

Although there is no consensus about the exact span of time that corresponds to the American Enlightenment, it is safe to say that it occurred during the eighteenth century among thinkers in British North America and the early United States and was inspired by the ideas of the British and French Enlightenments.  Based on the metaphor of bringing light to the Dark Age, the Age of the Enlightenment (Siècle des lumières in French and Aufklärung in German) shifted allegiances away from absolute authority, whether religious or political, to more skeptical and optimistic attitudes about human nature, religion and politics.  In the American context, thinkers such as Thomas Paine, James Madison, Thomas Jefferson, John Adams and Benjamin Franklin invented and adopted revolutionary ideas about scientific rationality, religious toleration and experimental political organization—ideas that would have far-reaching effects on the development of the fledgling nation.  Some coupled science and religion in the notion of deism; others asserted the natural rights of man in the anti-authoritarian doctrine of liberalism; and still others touted the importance of cultivating virtue, enlightened leadership and community in early forms of republican thinking. At least six ideas came to punctuate American Enlightenment thinking: deism, liberalism, republicanism, conservatism, toleration and scientific progress. Many of these were shared with European Enlightenment thinkers, but in some instances took a uniquely American form.

Table of Contents

  1. Enlightenment Age Thinking
    1. Moderate and Radical
    2. Chronology
    3. Democracy and the Social Contract
  2. Six Key Ideas
    1. Deism
    2. Liberalism
    3. Republicanism
    4. Conservatism
    5. Toleration
    6. Scientific Progress
  3. Four American Enlightenment Thinkers
    1. Franklin
    2. Jefferson
    3. Madison
    4. Adams
  4. Contemporary Work
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Enlightenment Age Thinking

The pre- and post-revolutionary era in American history generated propitious conditions for Enlightenment thought to thrive on an order comparable to that witnessed in the European Enlightenments.   In the pre-revolutionary years, Americans reacted to the misrule of King George III, the unfairness of Parliament (“taxation without representation”) and exploitative treatment at the hands of a colonial power: the English Empire.  The Englishman-cum-revolutionary Thomas Paine wrote the famous pamphlet The Rights of Man, decrying the abuses of the North American colonies by their English masters.  In the post-revolutionary years, a whole generation of American thinkers would found a new system of government on liberal and republican principles, articulating their enduring ideas in documents such as the Declaration of Independence, the Federalist Papers and the United States Constitution.

 

Although distinctive features arose in the eighteenth-century American context, much of the American Enlightenment was continuous with parallel experiences in British and French society.  Four themes recur in both European and American Enlightenment texts: modernization, skepticism, reason and liberty. Modernization means that beliefs and institutions based on absolute moral, religious and political authority (such as the divine right of kings and the Ancien Régime) will become increasingly eclipsed by those based on science, rationality and religious pluralism.  Many Enlightenment thinkers—especially the French philosophes, such as Voltaire, Rousseau and Diderot—subscribed to some form of skepticism, doubting appeals to miraculous, transcendent and supernatural forces that potentially limit the scope of individual choice and reason.  Reason that is universally shared and definitive of the human nature also became a dominant theme in Enlightenment thinkers’ writings, particularly Immanuel Kant’s “What is Enlightenment?” and his Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals.  The fourth theme, liberty and rights assumed a central place in theories of political association, specifically as limits state authority originating prior to the advent of states (that is, in a state of nature) and manifesting in social contracts, especially in John Locke’s Second Treatise on Civil Government and Thomas Jefferson’s drafts of the Declaration of Independence.  

a. Moderate and Radical

Besides identifying dominant themes running throughout the Enlightenment period, some historians, such as Henry May and Jonathan Israel, understand Enlightenment thought as divisible into two broad categories, each reflecting the content and intensity of ideas prevalent at the time.  The moderate Enlightenment signifies commitments to economic liberalism, religious toleration and constitutional politics.   In contrast to its moderate incarnation, the radical Enlightenment conceives enlightened thought through the prism of revolutionary rhetoric and classical Republicanism.  Some commentators argue that the British Enlightenment (especially figures such as James Hutton, Adam Ferguson and Adam Smith) was essentially moderate, while the French (represented by Denis Diderot, Claude Adrien Helvétius and François Marie Arouet) was decidedly more radical.  Influenced as it was by the British and French, American Enlightenment thought integrates both moderate and radical elements.

b. Chronology

American Enlightenment thought can also be appreciated chronologically, or in terms of three temporal stages in the development of Enlightenment Age thinking.  The early stage stretches from the time of the Glorious Revolution of 1688 to 1750, when members of Europe’s middle class began to break free from the monarchical and aristocratic regimes—whether through scientific discovery, social and political change or emigration outside of Europe, including America.  The middle stage extends from 1751 to just a few years after the start of the American Revolution in 1779. It is characterized by an exploding fascination with science, religious revivalism and experimental forms of government, especially in the United States.  The late stage begins in 1780 and ends with the rise of Napoléon Bonaparte, as the French Revolution comes to a close in 1815—a period in which the European Enlightenment was in decline, while the American Enlightenment reclaimed and institutionalized many of its seminal ideas.  However, American Enlightenment thinkers were not always of a single mind with their European counterparts.  For instance, several American Enlightenment thinkers—particularly James Madison and John Adams, though not Benjamin Franklin—judged the French philosophes to be morally degenerate intellectuals of the era.

c. Democracy and the Social Contract

Many European and American Enlightenment figures were critical of democracy.  Skepticism about the value of democratic institutions was likely a legacy of Plato’s belief that democracy led to tyranny and Aristotle’s view that democracy was the best of the worst forms of government.  John Adams and James Madison perpetuated the elitist and anti-democratic idea that to invest too much political power in the hands of uneducated and property-less people was to put society at constant risk of social and political upheaval.  Although several of America’s Enlightenment thinkers condemned democracy, others were more receptive to the idea of popular rule as expressed in European social contract theories.  Thomas Jefferson was strongly influenced by John Locke’s social contract theory, while Thomas Paine found inspiration in Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s.  In the Two Treatises on Government (1689 and 1690), Locke argued against the divine right of kings and in favor of government grounded on the consent of the governed; so long as people would have agreed to hand over some of their liberties enjoyed in a pre-political society or state of nature in exchange for the protection of basic rights to life, liberty and property.  However, if the state reneged on the social contract by failing to protect those natural rights, then the people had a right to revolt and form a new government. Perhaps more of a democrat than Locke, Rousseau insisted in The Social Contract (1762) that citizens have a right of self-government, choosing the rules by which they live and the judges who shall enforce those rules. If the relationship between the will of the state and the will of the people (the “general will”) is to be democratic, it should be mediated by as few institutions as possible.

2. Six Key Ideas

 

At least six ideas came to punctuate American Enlightenment thinking: deism, liberalism, republicanism, conservatism, toleration and scientific progress. Many of these were shared with European Enlightenment thinkers, but in some instances took a uniquely American form.

a. Deism

European Enlightenment thinkers conceived tradition, custom and prejudice (Vorurteil) as barriers to gaining true knowledge of the universal laws of nature.  The solution was deism or understanding God’s existence as divorced from holy books, divine providence, revealed religion, prophecy and miracles; instead basing religious belief on reason and observation of the natural world.   Deists appreciated God as a reasonable Deity.  A reasonable God endowed humans with rationality in order that they might discover the moral instructions of the universe in the natural law.  God created the universal laws that govern nature, and afterwards humans realize God’s will through sound judgment and wise action.  Deists were typically (though not always) Protestants, sharing a disdain for the religious dogmatism and blind obedience to tradition exemplified by the Catholic Church.  Rather than fight members of the Catholic faith with violence and intolerance, most deists resorted to the use of tamer weapons such as humor and mockery.

Both moderate and radical American Enlightenment thinkers, such as James Madison, Benjamin Franklin, Alexander Hamilton, John Adams and George Washington, were deists.   Some struggled with the tensions between Calvinist orthodoxy and deist beliefs, while other subscribed to the populist version of deism advanced by Thomas Paine in The Age of Reason.  Franklin was remembered for stating in the Constitutional Convention that “the longer I live, the more convincing proof I see of this truth—that God governs in the affairs of men.”  In what would become known as the Jefferson Bible (originally The Life and Morals of Jesus of Nazareth), Jefferson chronicles the life and times of Jesus Christ from a deist perspective, eliminating all mention of miracles or divine intervention.  God for deists such as Jefferson never loomed large in humans’ day-to-day life beyond offering a moral or humanistic outlook and the resource of reason to discover the content of God’s laws.  Despite the near absence of God in human life, American deists did not deny His existence, largely because the majority of the populace still remained strongly religious, traditionally pious and supportive of the good works (for example monasteries, religious schools and community service) that the clergy did.

b. Liberalism

Another idea central to American Enlightenment thinking is liberalism, that is, the notion that humans have natural rights and that government authority is not absolute, but based on the will and consent of the governed.  Rather than a radical or revolutionary doctrine, liberalism was rooted in the commercial harmony and tolerant Protestantism embraced by merchants in Northern Europe, particularly Holland and England.  Liberals favored the interests of the middle class over those of the high-born aristocracy, an outlook of tolerant pluralism that did not discriminate between consumers or citizens based on their race or creed, a legal system devoted to the protection of private property rights, and an ethos of strong individualism over the passive collectivism associated with feudal arrangements. Liberals also preferred rational argumentation and free exchange of ideas to the uncritical of religious doctrine or governmental mandates.  In this way, liberal thinking was anti-authoritarian.  Although later liberalism became associated with grassroots democracy and a sharp separation of the public and private domains, early liberalism favored a parliamentarian form of government that protected liberty of expression and movement, the right to petition the government, separation of church and state and the confluence of public and private interests in philanthropic and entrepreneurial endeavors.

The claim that private individuals have fundamental God-given rights, such as to property, life, liberty and to pursue their conception of  good, begins with the English philosopher John Locke, but also finds expression in Thomas Jefferson’s drafting of the Declaration of Independence.  The U.S. Bill of Rights, the first ten amendments to the Constitution, guarantees a schedule of individual rights based on the liberal ideal.  During the constitutional convention, James Madison responded to the anti-Federalists’ demand for a bill of rights as a condition of ratification by reviewing over two-hundred proposals and distilling them into an initial list of twelve suggested amendments to the Constitution, covering the rights of free speech, religious liberty, right to bear arms and habeas corpus, among others.  While ten of those suggested were ratified in 1791, one missing amendment (stopping laws created  by Congress to increase its members’ salaries from taking effect until the next legislative term) would have to wait until 1992 to be ratified as the Twenty-seventh Amendment.  Madison’s concern that the Bill of Rights should apply not only to the federal government would eventually be accommodated with the passage of the Fourteenth Amendment (especially its due process clause) in 1868 and a series of Supreme Court cases throughout the twentieth-century interpreting each of the ten amendments as “incorporated” and thus protecting citizens against state governments as well.

c. Republicanism

Classical republicanism is a commitment to the notion that a nation ought to be ruled as a republic, in which selection of the state’s highest public official is determined by a general election, rather than through a claim to hereditary right.  Republican values include civic patriotism, virtuous citizenship and property-based personality.  Developed during late antiquity and early renaissance, classic republicanism differed from early liberalism insofar as rights were not thought to be granted by God in a pre-social state of nature, but were the products of living in political society.  On the classical republican view of liberty, citizens exercise freedom within the context of existing social relations, historical associations and traditional communities, not as autonomous individuals set apart from their social and political ties.  In this way, liberty for the classical republican is positively defined by the political society instead of negatively defined in terms of the pre-social individual’s natural rights.

While prefigured by the European Enlightenment, the American Enlightenment also promoted the idea that a nation should be governed as a republic, whereby the state’s head is popularly elected, not appointed through a hereditary blood-line.  As North American colonists became increasingly convinced that British rule was corrupt and inimical to republican values, they joined militias and eventually formed the American Continental Army under George Washington’s command.   The Jeffersonian ideal of the yeoman farmer, which had its roots in the similar Roman ideal, represented the eighteenth-century American as both a hard-working agrarian and as a citizen-soldier devoted to the republic.  When elected to the highest office of the land, George Washington famously demurred when offered a royal title, preferring instead the more republican title of President.  Though scholarly debate persists over the relative importance of liberalism and republicanism during the American Revolution and Founding (see Recent Work section), the view that republican ideas were a formative influence on American Enlightenment thinking has gained widespread acceptance.

d. Conservatism

Though the Enlightenment is more often associated with liberalism and republicanism, an undeniable strain of conservatism emerged in the last stage of the Enlightenment, mainly as a reaction to the excesses of the French Revolution.  In 1790 Edmund Burkeanticipated the dissipation of order and decency in French society following the revolution (often referred to as “the Terror”) in his Reflections on the Revolution in France.  Though it is argued that Burkean conservatism was a reaction to the Enlightenment (or anti-Enlightenment), conservatives were also operating within the framework of Enlightenment ideas.  Some Enlightenment claims about human nature are turned back upon themselves and shown to break down when applied more generally to human culture.  For instance, Enlightenment faith in universal declarations of human rights do more harm than good when they contravene the conventions and traditions of specific nations, regions and localities. Similar to the classical republicans, Burke believed that human personality was the product of living in a political society, not a set of natural rights that predetermined our social and political relations. Conservatives attacked the notion of a social contract (prominent in the work of Hobbes, Locke and Rousseau) as a mythical construction that overlooked the plurality of groups and perspectives in society, a fact which made brokering compromises inevitable and universal consent impossible.  Burke only insisted on a tempered version, not a wholesale rejection of Enlightenment values.

Conservatism featured strongly in American Enlightenment thinking.  While Burke was critical of the French Revolution, he supported the American Revolution for disposing of English colonial misrule while creatively readapting British traditions and institutions to the American temperament.  American Enlightenment thinkers such as James Madison and John Adams held views that echoed and in some cases anticipated Burkean conservatism, leading them to criticize the rise of revolutionary France and the popular pro-French Jacobin clubs during and after the French Revolution.  In the forty-ninth Federalist Paper, James Madison deployed a conservative argument against frequent appeals to democratic publics on constitutional questions because they threatened to undermine political stability and substitute popular passion for the “enlightened reason” of elected representatives. Madison’s conservative view was opposed to Jefferson’s liberal view that a constitutional convention should be convened every twenty years, for “[t]he earth belongs to the living generation,” and so each new generation should be empowered to reconsider its constitutional norms.

e. Toleration

Toleration or tolerant pluralism was also a major theme in American Enlightenment thought.  Tolerance of difference developed in parallel with the early liberalism prevalent among Northern Europe’s merchant class.  It reflected their belief that hatred or fear of other races and creeds interfered with economic trade, extinguished freedom of thought and expression, eroded the basis for friendship among nations and led to persecution and war. Tiring of religious wars (particularly as the 16th century French wars of religion and the 17th century Thirty Years War), European Enlightenment thinkers imagined an age in which enlightened reason not religious dogmatism governed relations between diverse peoples with loyalties to different faiths. The Protestant Reformation and the Treaty of Westphalia significantly weakened the Catholic Papacy, empowered secular political institutions and provided the conditions for independent nation-states to flourish.

American thinkers inherited this principle of tolerant pluralism from their European Enlightenment forebearers.  Inspired by the Scottish Enlightenment thinkers John Knox and George Buchanan, American Calvinists created open, friendly and tolerant institutions such as the secular public school and democratically organized religion (which became the Presbyterian Church).   Many American Enlightenment thinkers, including Benjamin Franklin, Thomas Jefferson and James Madison, read and agreed with John Locke’s A Letter Concerning Toleration.  In it, Locke argued that government is ill-equipped to judge the rightness or wrongness of opposing religious doctrines, faith could not be coerced and if attempted the result would be greater religious and political discord.   So, civil government ought to protect liberty of conscience, the right to worship as one chooses (or not to worship at all) and refrain from establishing an official state-sanctioned church.  For America’s founders, the fledgling nation was to be a land where persons of every faith or no faith could settle and thrive peacefully and cooperatively without fear of persecution by government or fellow citizens.  Ben Franklin’s belief that religion was an aid to cultivating virtue led him to donate funds to every church in Philadelphia.  Defending freedom of conscience, James Madison would write that “[c]onscience is the most sacred of all property.”  In 1777, Thomas Jefferson drafted a religious liberty bill for Virginia to disestablish the government-sponsored Anglican Church—often referred to as “the precursor to the Religion Clauses of the First Amendment”—which eventually passed with James Madison’s help.

f. Scientific Progress

The Enlightenment enthusiasm for scientific discovery was directly related to the growth of deism and skepticism about received religious doctrine.  Deists engaged in scientific inquiry not only to satisfy their intellectual curiosity, but to respond to a divine calling to expose God’s natural laws.  Advances in scientific knowledge—whether the rejection of the geocentric model of the universe because of Copernicus, Kepler and Galileo’s work or the discovery of natural laws such as Newton’s mathematical explanation of gravity—removed the need for a constantly intervening God.  With the release of Sir Isaac Newton’s Principia in 1660, faith in scientific progress took institutional form in the Royal Society of England, the Académie des Sciences in France and later the Academy of Sciences in Germany.  In pre-revolutionary America, scientists or natural philosophers belonged to the Royal Society until 1768, when Benjamin Franklin helped create and then served as the first president of the American Philosophical Society.  Franklin became one of the most famous American scientists during the Enlightenment period because of his many practical inventions and his theoretical work on the properties of electricity.

3. Four American Enlightenment Thinkers

What follows are brief accounts of how four significant thinkers contributed to the eighteenth-century American Enlightenment: Benjamin Franklin, Thomas Jefferson, James Madison and John Adams.

a. Franklin

Benjamin Franklin, the author, printer, scientist and statesman who led America through a tumultuous period of colonial politics, a revolutionary war and its momentous, though no less precarious, founding as a nation.  In his Autobiography, he extolled the virtues of thrift, industry and money-making (or acquisitiveness).  For Franklin, the self-interested pursuit of material wealth is only virtuous when it coincides with the promotion of the public good through philanthropy and voluntarism—what is often called “enlightened self-interest.”  He believed that reason, free trade and a cosmopolitan spirit serve as faithful guides for nation-states to cultivate peaceful relations. Within nation-states, Franklin thought that “independent entrepreneurs make good citizens” because they pursue “attainable goals” and are “capable of living a useful and dignified life.” In his autobiography, Franklin claims that the way to “moral perfection” is to cultivate thirteen virtues (temperance, silence, order, resolution, frugality, industry, sincerity, justice, moderation, cleanliness, tranquility, chastity, and humility) as well as a healthy dose of “cheerful prudence.”  Franklin favored voluntary associations over governmental institutions as mechanisms to channel citizens’ extreme individualism and isolated pursuit of private ends into productive social outlets.  Not only did Franklin advise his fellow citizens to create and join these associations, but he also founded and participated in many himself.  Franklin was a staunch defender of federalism, a critic of narrow parochialism, a visionary leader in world politics and a strong advocate of religious liberty.

b. Jefferson

A Virginian statesman, scientist and diplomat, Jefferson is probably best known for drafting the Declaration of Independence.  Agreeing with Benjamin Franklin, he substituted “pursuit of happiness” for “property” in Locke’s schedule of natural rights, so that liberty to pursue the widest possible human ends would be accommodated.  Jefferson also exercised immense influence over the creation of the United States’ Constitution through his extended correspondence with James Madison during the 1787 Constitutional Convention (since Jefferson was absent, serving as a diplomat in Paris).  Just as Jefferson saw the Declaration as a test of the colonists’ will to revolt and separate from Britain, he also saw the Convention in Philadelphia, almost eleven years later, as a grand experiment in creating a new constitutional order.  Panel four of the Jefferson Memorial records how Thomas Jefferson viewed constitutions: “I am not an advocate for frequent changes in laws and constitutions, but laws and institutions must go hand in hand with the progress of the human mind. As that becomes more developed, more enlightened, as new discoveries are made, new truths discovered and manners and opinions change, with the change of circumstances, institutions must advance also to keep pace with the times.”  Jefferson’s words capture the spirit of organic constitutionalism, the idea that constitutions are living documents that transform over time in pace with popular thought, imagination and opinion.

c. Madison

Heralded as the “Father of the Constitution,” James Madison was, besides one of the most influential architects of the U.S. Constitution, a man of letters, a politician, a scientist and a diplomat who left an enduring legacy on American philosophical thought.  As a tireless advocate for the ratification of the Constitution, Madison advanced his most groundbreaking ideas in his jointly authoring The Federalist Papers with John Jay and Alexander Hamilton.  Indeed, two of his most enduring ideas—the large republic thesis and the argument for separation-of-powers and checks-and-balances—are contained there.  In the tenth Federalist paper, Madison explains the problem of factions, namely, that the development of groups with shared interests (advocates or interest groups) is inevitable and dangerous to republican government.  If we try to vanquish factions, then we will in turn destroy the liberty upon which their existence and activities are founded. Baron d’ Montesquieu, the seventeenth-century French philosopher, believed that the only way to have a functioning republic, one that was sufficiently democratic, was for it to be small, both in population and land mass (on the order of Ancient Athens or Sparta).  He then argues that a large and diverse republic will stop the formation of a majority faction; if small groups cannot communicate over long distances and coordinate effectively, the threat will be negated and liberty will be preserved (“you make it less probable that a majority of the whole will have a common motive to invade the rights of other citizens”).  When factions formed inside the government, a clever institutional design of checks and balances (first John Adams’s idea, where each branch would have a hand in the others’ domain) would avert excessive harm, so that “ambition must be made to counteract ambition” and, consequently, government will effectively “control itself.”

d. Adams

John Adams was also a founder, statesman, diplomat and eventual President who contributed to American Enlightenment thought.  Among his political writings, three stand out: Dissertation on the Canon and Feudal Law (1776), A Defense of the Constitutions of Government of the United States of America, Against the Attack of M. Turgot (1787-8), and Discourses on Davila (1791).  In the Dissertation, Adams faults Great Britain for deciding to introduce canon and feudal law, “the two greatest systems of tyranny,” to the North American colonies. Once introduced, elections ceased in the North American colonies, British subjects felt enslaved and revolution became inevitable.   In the Defense, Adams offers an uncompromising defense of republicanism.  He disputes Turgot’s apology for unified and centralized government, arguing that insurance against consolidated state power and support for individual liberty require separating government powers between branches and installing careful checks and balances.  Nevertheless, a strong executive branch is needed to defend the people against “aristocrats” who will attempt to deprive liberty from the mass of people.  Revealing the Enlightenment theme of conservatism, Adams criticized the notion of unrestricted popular rule or pure democracy in the Discourses.  Since humans are always desirous of increasing their personal power and reputation, all the while making invidious comparisons, government must be designed to constrain the effects of these passionate tendencies.  Adams writes: “Consider that government is intended to set bounds to passions which nature has not limited; and to assist reason, conscience, justice, and truth in controlling interests which, without it, would be as unjust as uncontrollable.”

4. Contemporary Work

Invocations of universal freedom draw their inspiration from Enlightenment thinkers such as John Locke, Immanuel Kant, and Thomas Jefferson, but come into conflict with contemporary liberal appeals to multiculturalism and pluralism.  Each of these Enlightenment thinkers sought to ground the legitimacy of the state on a theory of rational-moral political order reflecting universal truths about human nature—for instance, that humans are carriers of inalienable rights (Locke), autonomous agents (Kant), or fundamentally equal creations (Jefferson).  However, many contemporary liberals—for instance, Graeme Garrard, John Gray and Richard Rorty—fault Enlightenment liberalism for its failure to acknowledge and accommodate the differences among citizens’ incompatible and equally reasonable religious, moral and philosophical doctrines, especially in multicultural societies.  According to these critics, Enlightenment liberalism, rather than offering a neutral framework, discloses a full-blooded doctrine that competes with alternative views of truth, the good life, and human nature.  This pluralist critique of Enlightenment liberalism’s universalism makes it difficult to harmonize the American Founders’ appeal to universal human rights with their insistence on religious tolerance.  However, as previously noted, evidence of Burkean conservatism offers an alternative to the strong universalism that these recent commentators criticize in American Enlightenment thought.

What in recent times has been characterized as the ‘Enlightenment project’ is the general idea that human rationality can and should be made to serve ethical and humanistic ends.  If human societies are to achieve genuine moral progress, parochialism, dogma and prejudice ought to give way to science and reason in efforts to solve pressing problems. The American Enlightenment project signifies how America has taken a leading role in promoting Enlightenment ideals during that period of human history commonly referred to as ‘modernity.’  Still, there is no consensus about the exact legacy of American Enlightenment thinkers—for instance, whether republican or liberal ideas are predominant.  Until the publication of J. G. A. Pocock’s The Machiavellian Moment (1975), most scholars agreed that liberal (especially Lockean) ideas were more dominant than republican ones.  Pockock’s work initiated a sea change towards what is now the widely accepted view that liberal and republican ideas had relatively equal sway during the eighteenth-century Enlightenment, both in America and Europe.  Gordon Wood and Bernard Bailyn contend that republicanism was dominant and liberalism recessive in American Enlightenment thought.  Isaac Kramnick still defends the orthodox position that American Enlightenment thinking was exclusively Lockean and liberal, thus explaining the strongly individualistic character of modern American culture.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bailyn, Bernard. The Ideological Origins of the American Revolution. Harvard: Harvard University Press, 1967.
  • Ferguson, Robert A. The American Enlightenment. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1997.
  • Hampson, Norman. The Enlightenment: An Evaluation of its Assumptions. London: Penguin, 1968.
  • Himmelfarb, Gertrude. The Roads to Modernity: The British, French and American Enlightenments. London: Vintage, 2008.
  • Israel, Jonathan. A Resolution of the Mind—Radical Enlightenment and the Intellectual Origins of Modern Democracy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2009.
  • Kramnick, Isaac. Age of Ideology: Political Thought, 1750 to the Present. New York: Prentice Hall, 1979.
  • May, Henry F. The Enlightenment in America. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1978.
  • O’Brien, Conor Cruise. The Long Affair: Thomas Jefferson and the French Revolution, 1785-1800. London: Pimlico, 1998.
  • O’Hara, Kieron. The Enlightenment: A Beginner’s Guide. Oxford: OneWorld, 2010.
  • Pockock, John G. A. The Machiavellian Moment: Florentine Political Thought and the American Republican Tradition. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1975.
  • Wilson, Ellen J. and Peter H. Reill. Encyclopedia of the Enlightenment. New York: Book Builders Inc., 2004.
  • Wood, Gordon. The Creation of the American Republic. Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press, 1969.

Author Information

Shane J. Ralston
Email: sjr21@psu.edu
Pennsylvania State University
U. S. A.

American Transcendentalism

American transcendentalism is essentially a kind of practice by which the world of facts and the categories of common sense are temporarily exchanged for the world of ideas and the categories of imagination. The point of this exchange is to make life better by lifting us above the conflicts and struggles that weigh on our souls. As these chains fall away, our souls rise to heightened experiences of freedom and union with the good. Emerson and Thoreau are the two most significant nineteenth century proponents of American transcendentalism.

Looking at the world through common sense categories, such as time, space, and causation, yields hard and fast limits that can hurt us. Causation seems to make certain outcomes unavoidable whether we like them or not. Space separates us from the ones we love and the places we would rather be. Not to be outdone, time brings all good things to an end and converts the living into the dead. The categories of imagination free us from these detestable limits. We can imagine a world in which physical space is no more than an idea, enabling us to move from place to place at the speed of our thoughts. Emanation and fulguration make congenial substitutes for causation, because they generate only what is true, beautiful, and good. Not even time presents a problem for imagination, since we can readily view all things from the standpoint of eternity.

Most philosophers start with theories, searching for ways in which to practice what they preach only if they are serious about their philosophies. The transcendentalists reversed this procedure. They began with practices and then attempted to establish them on solid theoretical foundations. Yet these practices all involved spurning certain facts in favor of ideas, leading them invariably to theories that are inconsistent and vague. Their honesty would not allow them to spurn all facts, so they were ever at work reshaping intractable facts to fit their theories or stretching the fabric of their views to cover uncooperative facts. Unwitting victims of their own scruples, they found themselves hating facts that did not fit the mold and being frustrated with theories they knew failed to capture all the facts.

The final victim was transcendentalism itself. Critics, eager to wield the sword of criticism, overlooked the life-enhancing practices at the core of transcendentalism, concentrating their efforts on the many chinks and thin plates in its theoretical armor. Their blades penetrated easily, and they quickly pronounced their victim hopelessly baffling. Even friendly critics felt obliged to begin their articles with the proviso that transcendentalism is not easily articulated.

The transcendentalists were suspended between imagination and common sense. If they had been consistent empiricists or materialists, their theories might have been securely founded on facts. Had they been fully fledged idealists or rationalists, their theories might have been firmly fixed on logical relations. In reality, they were neither consistent nor fully fledged theorists. Emerson complained of a see-saw in his voice. Yet what is most valuable in the legacy of transcendentalism is not theoretical and is not in need of theoretical backing. It is the practices by which the transcendentalists managed, at least occasionally, to re-make the world in the image of what they loved.

Table of Contents

  1. Emerson and His Practices
  2. German Influence
  3. British Influence
  4. Idealism
  5. Morality
  6. Beauty
  7. Contemporary Relevance
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Emerson and His Practices

Although he denied he was a transcendentalist, Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803-1882) was rightly viewed by his peers and is rightly viewed by contemporary scholars as the primary philosophical exponent of American transcendentalism, followed by Henry David Thoreau (1817-1862). Emerson distinguished at least three practices by which facts may be exchanged for ideas. The first enacts a form of idealism. Instead of seeing the world as an independent power that may lay waste to our purposes and plans, we can view it as a display of images or pictures created by us, rendering it harmless and even benevolent. Secondly, we can focus on moral actions and rejoice in their goodness. The third practice distinguished by Emerson is perhaps the one for which transcendentalism is best known. It is that of contemplating beauty.

These practices come naturally to many of us. We many not connect them to Emerson, his contemporaries, or the period in American intellectual history─roughly between the publication of Emerson’s “Nature” in 1836 and Thoreau’s death in 1862─when transcendentalism flourished as a movement; but inasmuch as we seek to improve our lives by turning away from facts and embracing ideas, we are transcendentalists.

2. German Influence

Word of Kant’s transcendental idealism may have reached Emerson through Frederick Henry Hedge (1805-1890), a Unitarian minister who had studied in Germany and knew German philosophy in its native tongue. In 1836, Hedge, Emerson, and George Ripley (1802-1880) founded an informal group they called Hedge’s Club for the purpose of stimulating discussion of current topics in philosophy and theology. The group convened irregularly for about seven years and grew to include at least a dozen members. It became known as the Transcendental Club. These meetings provided ample opportunity for Hedge to share his knowledge of Kant’s transcendental philosophy with Emerson.

The heart of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason is the distinction he draws between the transcendental and the transcendent. The transcendental refers to the necessary conditions of the possibility of experience. Input from perception is grasped through twelve categories, space, time, and what he calls the transcendental unity of apperception. These are structures of mind, so without them experience would be impossible. In contrast, the transcendent is that which lies beyond the scope of experience and is therefore inaccessible to conceptual knowledge. In his Critique of Pure Reason, Kant rejects the classic arguments for the existence of God on the grounds that knowledge of the transcendent is impossible. Ironically, the transcendental structure of mind is necessarily incapable of providing knowledge of the transcendent.

But Kant followed the Critique of Pure Reason with the Critique of Practical Reason, in which he adds an important qualification to his original view that God is unknowable. The transcendent, he argues, is the very foundation of morality. If not for God, the wicked might go unpunished and the righteous unrewarded. We may not be able to have conceptual knowledge of the transcendent, but we are morally obligated to act as the transcendent in the form of the free and rational moral will.

Kant’s view of our relation to the transcendent underwent a second transformation in his third major work, the Critique of Judgment. There he reconsiders some of the classic arguments for God’s existence and opts for the teleological. Organic beings are purposive, he tells us, though we cannot glean what their purposes are. Their purposiveness consists in the fact that they and their parts are mutually supporting. The parts are means to the wholes, and the wholes are means to the parts. Two important conclusions fall out of this analysis. The first is that everything can be seen as beautiful, because all objects have form, which hints at a kind of purposiveness based on the internal complexity of objects. This purposiveness of form creates a universal disinterested satisfaction that is experienced as beauty. The second conclusion is that conceptual understanding of beauty is impossible for human beings.

Although they are very different philosophies, the influence of Kant’s transcendental idealism on American transcendentalism is easy to see. The philosophies are markedly different because the Americans did not preserve Kant’s distinction between the transcendent and the transcendental. This distinction provides the framework for Kant’s entire system as presented in the Critique of Pure Reason, but the transcendentalists were not interested in systems or the frameworks of systems. What attracted them to Kant’s philosophy was the sentiment behind his words. One look at the prevailing sentiment of American transcendentalism and Kant’s influence is unmistakable. The Americans eagerly joined him in celebrating the rightness of moral action, the beauty of the world, and the majesty of God. Kant’s influence also shows itself in the view of the nature of beauty embraced by the transcendentalists, namely that it surpasses all understanding.

3. British Influence

The word “transcendental” brings to mind Kant and the German philosophers he influenced, but German thinkers were not the only ones to leave their mark on American transcendentalism. Emerson was a great admirer of William Wordsworth and Samuel Taylor Coleridge, both of whom he met when he traveled to Europe in 1832. Their romanticism was intoxicating to him, and he seems to have passed some of that intoxication to his friend Thoreau. The British romantics shared the same love of beauty, morality, and God that animated both Kant and the American transcendentalists, but the romantics had developed a unique perspective on our relation to those realities. This perspective provided one of the central features of American transcendentalism.

The British romantics saw tremendous beauty and goodness in the world. At the same time, they saw that all of that goodness and beauty is flawed. Human beings often embody great virtues, but this is not always so. Sometimes their behavior is monstrous in its selfishness and cruelty. The sky, the meadow, and the rose are breathtakingly beautiful, but as time passes their beauty fades. This double vision of the romantics, although it did not betray any facts, nevertheless placed them in the uncomfortable position of both hating and loving the world.

To get out of their predicament, the romantics made a bold move. They set their sights on the perfect, which for them could exist only beyond the awful limits of the world. Yet they could not forget that they were, as flesh and blood, inextricably tied to those very limits. Nor could they forget that it was those very limits that provided the precious glimpses of beauty and goodness, however degraded, that they cherished. This was a great tragedy, they decided, and it was made even greater by the fact that it was inevitable. If you live in this world and you have enough humanity to love the good and the beautiful, you will be constantly assailed by the pain of falling short of those ideals. Yet, they suggested, the more the tragedy of life appeared to us in all of its inevitability and pain, the more beautiful life would be in our eyes.

Had they embraced this perspective at face value, the transcendentalists might have been cheered. As a sequence of random events, some good and others bad, life is arguably meaningless and not worth living. But view it as a tragedy and life takes on a marvelous aesthetic unity. Anguish and tears become literary realities, beautiful in their significance and in the timeless moral lessons they convey. But the transcendentalists were too pragmatic to embrace such an intellectual view of life. The world was too much with them, and although they never tired of translating facts into ideas, they could not shake the sense that facts were somehow more real. Instead of cheering them up, their contact with romanticism ultimately saddened them. They fell in love with the perfect like good romantics, but they could find little beauty in the countless misfortunes that befell them. They felt betrayed by life. In Emerson, this feeling expressed itself in the form of sheer disbelief at the terrible things that happened to him. In Thoreau, it created a thin layer of bitterness and resentment that never dissipated.

The influence of the British romantics shaped American transcendentalism at least as much and probably more than that of Kant’s transcendental philosophy. Their influence contributed a longing for the perfect, one of the central features of transcendentalism in America. The other side of this contribution, equally central, was a treacherous undercurrent of disappointment and sadness.

4. Idealism

The idealism of the American transcendentalists, like their morality and their love of beauty, took the form of practices before it became, as an afterthought, a sort of theory. Emerson stood with his head between his legs and took note of the fact that this opened a very different reality. His long country rambles produced in him a profound feeling of the lawfulness and rationality of nature. The passions that stirred in his breast often burst forth in the form of an essay or a poem. Looking at the world from different angles, delighting in the patterns nature manifests, and writing poetry or prose are idealistic practices in the sense that they give consciousness a kind of priority. In creating new experiences or ideas, we seem to create new worlds, and mind takes on a status close to that of a divinity. The old familiar facts, when filtered through the categories of imagination, are given an almost miraculous appearance. We are free from their tedious and often sorrowful limits to roam at liberty in thought.

For the transcendentalists, this freedom was almost always short-lived. This is because they felt they should ground their idealistic practices in a consistent theory. The freedom and satisfaction their practices provided, they reasoned, would be more secure if given an adequate theoretical backing. Their reasoning may have been sound, but their attempt to ground their practices in an adequate theory had the opposite effect. They became tangled in theoretical problems that proved intractable, and this made engaging with ideas for the sake of the activity itself more difficult. An ulterior motive for this engagement was always pressing on them. The ideas could not be fully trusted unless somehow it could be shown that they captured the inner nature of things.

But the main idea implied by the transcendentalists’ practices, that all existence must conform to consciousness, was verified by their experience only occasionally. There were flashes of verification, as when Emerson dreamed he ate the world, but all too often it was consciousness that had to give way to the cold facts of existence. The loss of his beloved wife Ellen Tucker, his cherished son Waldo, and his dear friend Thoreau signaled to Emerson that something alien to mind was at work in the world.

What this alien something might be, the transcendentalists had no clear idea. Their idealism gave consciousness, rational principles, and human values the status of omnipotent governing powers. Evil was that for which there would be compensation, or it was an instrument necessary for the creation of a good far greater than any that would have been possible without its use. It was, in short, thoroughly intelligible, just, and even benevolent: a low mood or a contradictory thought passing through the Oversoul for the sake of its ultimate enrichment. Evil is good, or rather it has to be good if one takes the idealism of the transcendentalists at face value. Not even they were capable of doing this all the time, yet they had no means of understanding evil except through the lens of their idealism, nor would they have been comfortable viewing it through a different lens as a brute fact or an irrational power.

The only option for the transcendentalists was to live with one more evil, namely the fact that evil positively confounded their attempts to explain it. This made the evils they suffered that much worse, adding avoidable surprise and puzzlement to unavoidable pain. Had they been content to practice their idealism without attempting to expound it, they might have saved themselves considerable grief. Their idealistic practices alone do not give mind the kind of priority proper to a power, but they do give it a sort of valuational priority. In lavishly applying the categories of imagination to the world and marveling at the results, we affirm the priority of consciousness and its products in the sense of loving them the most. As long as this does not lead us to the tenuous theory that all existence must submit to mind, we are free to understand evil through the categories of common sense, as a rogue power that goes against our purposes and often overwhelms them. This does not translate evil into good, but it at least removes the sting of surprise and confusion when evil strikes.

5. Morality

Emerson was often accused of being a reluctant reformer, and behind those accusations there was a kernel of truth. His contemporaries in the United States and Europe were hungry for moral progress, and they wasted no time putting shoulder to wheel for their favorite causes. Emerson was different in that his temperament inclined him to be first a scholar. The purpose of scholars, he said, is to nurture the good in others; but what makes a scholar is the ability to see the larger picture of things, and for this a certain distance from the heat of action is required. Emerson was by nature a visionary and a poet, not a man of action. No matter how much he sympathized with the ideals to which reformers aspired, he could not engage in actual reform without some initial discomfort. It was not what he was born to do.

Yet Emerson’s accusers failed to see the full reality of the accused. He may have hesitated before throwing his weight behind a cause for fear of losing the reflective distance he naturally valued; but if the cause was just he almost always ended up fighting for it. When the government of the United States announced plans to force Cherokees from their native lands, Emerson wrote President Van Buren in protest. The reflective but deeply moral Emerson opposed slavery openly both in writing and in public lectures. Inspired by his friend Margaret Fuller, Emerson supported the burgeoning women’s rights movement, becoming Vice President of the New England Women’s Suffrage Association in 1869. It is ironic that for all the accusations of reluctance made against him by his peers, today’s scholars tend to view Emerson as one of the nineteenth century’s most important reformers.

Emerson’s reflective temperament made him skeptical of reform movements, which seemed to him to be driven by narrow and hasty views. At the same time, he was convinced that it is not the group but the individual that is the ultimate agent of moral progress. He admired and celebrated the moral actions of principled individuals and was often spurred by them to act in spite of his temperament. This is transcendentalism at its moral best. Moral action is not governed or called forth by a theory; it is a spontaneous response to the feeling of one’s individual potentiality combined with one’s natural love of the good. Assuming the good is not conceived narrowly, as it almost never was by Emerson, this kind of morality is less problematic than many others. Emerson was lead by it to some of his most important contributions to the reform movements of his day.

Again, the problem came when the transcendentalists attempted to ground their spontaneous practices in a theory that lodged their values in the nature of things. Emerson said many times that nature itself is the supreme model and ultimate ground of morality, since it is a manifestation of timeless moral laws. All evil is a form of instruction, pointing the way to better lives and a better world. No doubt Emerson embraced this view wholeheartedly, but its implications for specific evils that visited him created turmoil in his soul. He could not hide from himself the fact that some evils seemed to lack pedagogical value. It was hardly possible for him to view the death of his five year old son as instruction for the improvement of life. Nor was he easily able to see the fire that consumed his home as a lesson in how to make the world a better place. Their view of the world as inherently moral, like the idealism they attempted to develop, created for the transcendentalists a painful rift between the theory they thought they should live by and the actual events, actions, and emotions that filled their lives.

This was less so, at least as regards morality, for Thoreau. Emerson’s greatest student was less committed than his mentor to the view that nature is intrinsically moral. Thoreau, moreover, was more practical than Emerson in moral matters. He perceived with greater clarity the fact that institutions exist because of the free actions of individuals. If individual slaveholders decided to stop holding slaves, slavery would gradually be destroyed. Nor did Thoreau confuse this practical insight with Emerson’s more theoretical position that individuals are the ultimate moral agents because they have access, through reason and contemplation, to the moral laws inherent in nature.

While Emerson’s love of reflection often slowed his response time, Thoreau tended to react to moral problems quickly and decisively. He immediately urged those around him to examine their consciences and change their behaviors accordingly. Thoreau’s letter in support of John Brown, a controversial abolitionist convicted of treason, captures this pragmatic approach to morality. The letter is full of motivational rhetoric. Advancing the cause of abolition, Thoreau seems to have reasoned, was simply a matter of convincing enough individuals to oppose Brown’s conviction.

In their morality, the transcendentalists did not abandon their practice of exchanging facts and the categories of common sense for ideas and the categories of imagination. Nor did they lose all awareness of common sense or all contact with facts. This combination of circumstances might have propelled them to dizzying heights of theorizing in an attempt to reconcile the two poles of their vision, as it often did in relation to their idealism. But on the whole, not counting the theoretical flights in which Emerson argued for a moral structure of the world, the transcendentalists were more down to earth about morality than they were about metaphysics. Not only did they tend to avoid too much theorizing, they took their practice a step further. Having seen and appreciated a vision of how things ought to be, they went to work to improve the relevant facts in light of their ideas. In a word, the transcendentalists were meliorists.

6. Beauty

If there is a single practice with which American transcendentalism can be identified, it is contemplation of beauty. Emerson responded to Plato’s theory that beauty, truth, and goodness are one by saying that even so beauty is the best of the three. Children seem to see it radiating from the most ordinary objects to their exquisite delight. Adults sometimes find themselves feeling like children again in its presence. The transcendentalists thought of beauty as eternal, because a mere glimpse of it was enough to make them drop everything and simply take in what they heard or saw with neither motive nor intention. This activity satisfied them so deeply that while they were thus engaged it was as if time stood still.

Perhaps the most famous experience of beauty described by Emerson is the one in which he became a "transparent eyeball."  Alone in the woods, "head bathed by the blithe air, and uplifted into infinite space", he found that he had vanished from his own experience. It was as if he consisted of nothing but impersonal vision, the object of which was "unconstrained and immortal beauty."  Thoreau was equally susceptible to such enthralling experiences of beauty.  Snow drifts, the shapes and colors of leaves, and the way light falls revealed to him so much beauty that he thought of them as imprints of the divine.

Of the three practices distinguished by Emerson, contemplation of beauty is perhaps the one that came most naturally to the transcendentalists. They were ready, like Socrates, for beauty to give them wings on which they could ascend to heaven and see reality from the standpoint of the gods. Facts, with all of their hard edges, quickly melted into images or ideas under beauty’s divine influence. The contemplative absorptions this created were immensely satisfying, but they were also deceptive. Had the facts actually melted or did it merely seem as if they had?

Motivated by the tremendous appeal of the former hypothesis, Emerson attempted to extend the influence of beauty far beyond momentary absorptions. He reached the conclusion that everything is beautiful by arguing that beauty derives from purposiveness. Emerson thought of nature as a single, all-embracing system governed by immutable moral laws. In such a system, everything has a purpose in relation to the whole and is rendered beautiful by that relation. Marcus Aurelius proposed something similar in his Meditations. He said that even the foam at the mouths of ravening beasts takes on a certain beauty once its purpose is known.

The argument that purposiveness confers beauty is plausible when purposes are present and when they are at least arguably benevolent. A towering concrete dam may spoil the beauty of a river, until we understand that it was built to provide water to surrounding communities. Yet even though we see a benevolent purpose behind it, the ugliness of the dam may not be diminished. The argument is much weaker when applied to objects or events the purposes of which are evil, and it fails altogether in the case of realities that are non-purposive. Weapons of mass destruction are not rendered beautiful in light of their purpose. Earthquakes that strike major cities may occur for the sake of maintaining the structural equilibrium of the planet, but this adds little beauty to them. Moreover, nothing prevents us from understanding natural disasters as mechanical rather than purposive processes.

The transcendentalists were eminently capable of stretching their imaginations. When they exercised this capacity to the fullest, they saw around them an abstract world of interrelated ideas. The beauty of that world was so captivating that it tended to blind them to all external realities. Emerson went as far as to say there is a certain beauty in a corpse. We can hardly fault the transcendentalists for wishing to live always in the presence of the beautiful; yet the feats of imagination by which they conjured an ideal world could not be sustained forever. The transcendentalists were drawn to the beauty of ideas, but they knew they had to make their way in a world that also included stubborn facts. Once more we can see that it was not their practices, but their efforts to ground them in theories that created problems for the transcendentalists. Emerson’s attempt to demonstrate that all things are beautiful made ugliness a little uglier and a little sadder. Even worse, it made it confounding. When a homely or a grotesque fact intruded into the beautiful world of his ideas, he loathed it all the more because he could not make sense of the intrusion.

7. Contemporary Relevance

Theories that attempt to establish the inner nature of the world will always be interesting and instructive. They capture the imagination and, if we care to see, show us the limits of what we know. The transcendentalists never produced a complete theory. Producing one that placed their values at the core of reality would have required them to set aside their interest in action and their instinctive loyalty to facts. Instead, they theorized spontaneously in an attempt to shore up the practices that brought them closer to the good. The bits and pieces of theory they devised are of continuing relevance not because they capture corresponding portions of ultimate reality but because they show us the extent to which human beings are capable of loving all that is good in the world.

Although the transcendentalists did not succeed in grounding their practices in a fully developed theory of absolute reality, they did not need to succeed in this. Appreciating the marvelous creativity of consciousness, affirming moral action, and contemplating beauty are self-standing practices. One might explain them and the values they uphold equally well through a variety of theories, and many philosophers have developed complete systems that assign to beauty, morality, or consciousness the status of the real. The transcendentalists sought to secure their practices to theoretical foundations, but their practices are independent of all attempts to develop a satisfactory account of them. They do not need the support of theories as an airplane does not need wires to hold it in the air. Not only that, but the effort to ground practices in theories is fraught with frustration, since there are many plausible theories, and those that one dislikes must constantly be defended against. The life-long devotion of the transcendentalists to their practices, even as their theories changed and vexed them anew, suggests they sensed their practices would and perhaps should stand on their own.

It is hard to overstate the value of the practices that form the heart of transcendentalism. We tend to lose sight of the sheer improbability of awareness and the wonder of its products. The rightness of moral action does not always impress us, and we often fail to see beauty in ordinary objects and events. The focus on improvement instilled in many of us from childhood bogs us down in facts that demand accounting and predicting. We grow increasingly blind to the realm of imagination and possibilities. Consider what the world would be like if we practiced transcendentalism all the time. We would view consciousness as a wonder that is without equal in the universe. A single moral action either performed or witnessed would be cause for feeling good. Perhaps best of all, we would not miss even the smallest particle of beauty. A pattern, a color, a sparkle seen out of the corner of the eye would lift us above all dreary facts to the heights of contemplative joy. None of this would establish the good or the beautiful or even the true in the inner sanctum of reality, but it would enrich the reality that is our experience, and that is what the transcendentalists sought above all.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Emerson, R. W. Emerson’s Complete Works. 12 Vols. Boston: Houghton, Mifflin, and Company, 1883-93.
  • Emerson, R. W. Emerson in His Journals. Joel Porte, Ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982.
  • Gougeon, L. Virtue’s Hero: Emerson, Antislavery, and Reform. Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1990.
  • Gray, H. D. Emerson: A Statement of New England Transcendentalism as Expressed in the Philosophy of its Chief Exponent. New York: Frederick Ungar, 1970.
  • McAleer, J. J. Ralph Waldo Emerson: Days of Encounter. Boston: Little, Brown, and Company, 1984.
  • Packer, B. L. The Transcendentalists. Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 2007.
  • Richardson, R. D. Henry Thoreau: A Life of the Mind. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1986.
  • Thoreau, H. D. The Best of Thoreau’s Journals. Carl Bode, Ed. Carbondale, IL: Southern Illinois University Press, 1971.
  • Thoreau, H. D. Walden. Michael Meyer, Ed. London: Macmillan, 1995.
  • Thoreau, H. D. A Week on the Concord and Merrimack Rivers. Carl Hovde, Ed. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1980.
  • Myerson, Joel, Ed. Transcendentalism: A Reader. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.

 

Author Information

Michael Brodrick
Email: michael.brodrick@gmail.com
Indiana University Purdue University Indianapolis
U. S. A.

Josiah Royce (1855-1916): Overview

Josiah Royce was one of the most influential philosophers of the period of classical American philosophy, the late nineteenth century through the early twentieth century. Although often identified as an exponent of Absolute Idealism, which is a philosophical view explored by Royce particularly in his Gifford Lectures, Royce was a thinker of widely diverse interests and talents. He made major contributions to psychology including a textbook in the field and was, in fact, elected President of the American Psychological Association. He wrote a history of California, considered today a forerunner of contemporary historiography in its attention to the role of women and minority groups. He explored social ethics, developing many ideas on the social grounding of the self, some of which were later expanded upon by George Herbert Mead. Furthermore, Royce wrote on pressing social and political problems of the day including race relations. W.E.B. Dubois was one of his students. He wrote literary criticism and can be considered the founder of the Harvard school of logic, Boolean algebra, and the foundation of mathematics. Among his students at Harvard were Clarence Irving Lewis who went on to pioneer modal logic, Edward V. Huntington, the first to axiomatize Boolean algebra, and Henry M. Sheffer, known for the eponymous Sheffer stroke. Royce has recently been cited as a proto-cybernetic thinker; another of his students was Norbert Wiener, the father of cybernetics. Royce also wrote on issues in the philosophy of science.

In addition to these many philosophical achievements, Royce made major contributions to the Philosophy of Religion, writing on the problem of evil, and Christian community and presenting a phenomenological study of the religious experience of ordinary people. Royce also wrote throughout his career on ethical theory and on the conditions for creating both genuine and supportive communities as well as creative, unique, ethical individuality. At the end of his life he turned to the development of a world community through a process of mediation and interpretation.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Thought and Works
    1. Royce's Philosophy of Community
    2. Royce's Ethics: The Philosophy of Loyalty
    3. Religion
    4. The Problem of Evil
    5. Logic
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Published Editions
    3. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Josiah Royce was a Californian by birth, born on 20 November, 1855, in Grass Valley, the son of Josiah (1812-1888) and Sarah Eleanor (Bayliss) Royce (1819-1891), whose families were recent emigrants from England, and who sought their fortune in moving west in 1849. His pioneer mother Sarah was a central figure in forging a new social and political community in Grass Valley. She was the center of much musical activity with her melodeon, the first brought to California. She also helped found a church and served as a teacher of the young, including young Josiah. Under his mother’s tutelage, Josiah developed his love of literature, reading Milton and other literary works; made his acquaintance with the Bible and religious experience; was given an introduction to music and its beauty; and experienced the joys of a warm, loving community, his family, and particularly his mother and sisters. Young Josiah began his literary career with a delightful story of the travels of Pussy Blackie, a “Huckleberry Finn cat,” who runs away from home; gets bitten by a dog; is captured by an eagle; travels on a railroad car; lives in the house of a rich family; finds a cat companion with whom Pussy exchanges stories; discusses social issues such as the contrast between the rich and the poor, as well as the treatment of the less fortunate and moral questions such as honesty, shame, killing, and war. In 1866, the Royce family moved to San Francisco where Royce first attended the Lincoln School. Royce also attended San Francisco Boys’ High School where he had as a classmate the (later famous) physicist, Albert Michelson. Continuing his pioneer trek, Royce entered, at age fourteen, an infant University of California, later becoming one of its first graduates, thus participating in the beginnings of higher education in the state. After receiving his degree in Classics in 1875, Royce traveled to Germany to study philosophy for one year. He mastered the language while attending lectures in Heidelberg, Leipzig, and Göttingen. On his return, he entered the Johns Hopkins University in Baltimore and in 1878, was awarded one of its first four doctorates.

Josiah Royce returned to the University of California, Berkley from 1878-1882. He taught composition, and literature, published numerous philosophical articles and his Primer of Logical Analysis. He married Katherine Head in 1880; the couple had three sons (Christopher, 1882; Edward, 1886; Stephen, 1889) and remained married until Josiah’s death. Royce felt isolated in California, so far from the intellectual life of the East Coast, and he sought an academic post elsewhere. William James, Royce’s friend and philosophical antagonist, secured the opportunity for Royce to replace James at Harvard when James took a one-year sabbatical. In 1882, Royce accepted the position at half of James’ salary and brought his wife and newborn son across the continent to Cambridge, Massachusetts.

At Harvard, Royce began to develop his interest in a number of different areas. In 1885, he published his first major philosophical work, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, proposing the idea that in order for our ordinary concepts of truth and error to have meaning, there must be an actual infinite mind, an “Absolute Knower,” who encompasses the totality of actual truths and possible errors. That same year, Royce received a permanent appointment as assistant professor at Harvard, where he continued to teach for thirty years. Among his students were such notables as T.S. Eliot, George Santayana, W.E.B. Dubois, Norbert Wiener, and C.I. Lewis, the logician.

Royce was a prolific writer as well as much demanded on the public lecture circuit. In 1886, he published his History of California; he followed this with a published novel in 1887. In 1892, Royce was appointed Professor of the History of Philosophy at Harvard, and he served as Chair of the Department of Philosophy from 1894-1898. During these years Royce established himself as a leading figure in American academic philosophy with his many reviews, lectures and books, including The Spirit of Modern Philosophy, (1892), The Conception of God (1897), and Studies in Good and Evil (1898).

In 1899, and 1900, Royce delivered the prestigious Gifford Lectures at the University of Aberdeen, taking this opportunity to consolidate his thoughts on metaphysics. The result was his two-volume opus, The World and the Individual (1899-1901). This point appeared to be the culmination of Royce’s work. His public reputation was at a high and at 45 years old, Royce was elected President of the American Psychological Association in 1902, and President of the American Philosophical Association in 1903. Reviewers of The World and the Individual praised Royce’s philosophical acumen but there were serious objections to his conclusions. Sparked by these and the criticisms of his logic by Charles Sanders Peirce, Royce began reconsideration of his arguments as well as extensive study in mathematical logic. He also returned to his earlier concerns with philosophy as a means to understand human life, the nature of human society, of religious experience, ethical action, suffering and the problem of evil. His major work on ethics, The Philosophy of Loyalty appeared in 1908, but his concern with ethical issues and the “art” of loyalty continued until his death. He published a collection of essays, Race Questions, Provincialisms, and Other American Problems in 1908 and another, William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, appeared in 1911.

In 1912, while recovering from a stroke, Royce published The Sources of Religious Insight, in which he sought an explanation for the phenomena of ordinary religious faith as experienced by ordinary religious communities and individuals. He considered this a correction to James’ The Varieties of Religious Experience (The Gifford Lectures, 1901-1902), which, in Royce’s judgment, put too much emphasis on extraordinary and individualistic religious experiences. Drawing on the semiotic of Peirce and other sources, in 1913, Royce published his opus on religious community, The Problem of Christianity, a work which Yale philosopher, John E. Smith identified as “one of the finest works in the philosophy of religion ever to appear on the American scene” (Smith 1982 &1992, 122). In place of the earlier “Absolute Knower,” Royce presents the concept of an infinite community of interpretation, guided by a shared spirit of truth-seeking and community building. The Universal Community constitutes reality, and its understanding increases over time, through its members’ continual development of meaning. Royce’s concern for building a universal or “Beloved Community” is exemplified in two later works focused on building peace and a world community: War and Insurance (1914) and The Hope of the Great Community (1916). In the 1914 book, Royce made a daring political and economic proposal to use the economic power of insurance to mediate hostilities among nations, and reduce the attraction of war in the future.

Royce died September 14, 1916, before he could develop fully his new philosophical insights. Unfortunately, Royce’s works were ignored until recently and now are being revisited by theologians and philosophers interested in not only metaphysics, but also practical and theoretical ethics, philosophy of religion, philosophy of self and of community.

2. Thought and Works

Royce’s major works include The Religious Aspect of Philosophy (1885), The World and the Individual (1899-1901), The Spirit of Modern Philosophy (1892), The Philosophy of Loyalty (1908), and The Problem of Christianity (1913). In his early works, Royce presented a novel defense of idealism, the “argument from error,” and arrived at the concept of an actual infinite mind, an “Absolute Knower,” that encompasses all truths and possible errors. The correspondence theory of truth requires that if an idea or judgment is true it must correctly represent its object; when an idea does not correctly represent its object, it is an error. Royce begins with the fact that the human mind often makes such errors and yet, argued Royce, the mind “intends” or “points to” the idea’s true object. Thus, the occurrence of these errors indicates that the true object of any idea must exist, in a fully determinate state, in some actual infinite mind; this actual infinite “Mind” is the “Absolute Knower.” Royce continued to pursue this move toward Idealism in The World and the Individual. Here we find Royce agreeing with Kantian critical rationalism that a true idea is one that may be fulfilled or validated by a possible experience, but he argued that such a possibility of experience required the existence of an actual being, whose nature was to be the true object of the experience. In this work, Royce engages in criticism of three major views of metaphysics, Realism, Mysticism, and Kant’s Critical Rationalism. He finds valuable points in all three views, but also critical weaknesses. He advocates a “Fourth Conception of Being,” a view of the totality of Being as an actual Infinite, timeless, and encompassing all valid past, present, and future possible experience of fact including the facts of all finite beings.

Royce continued to develop his thoughts spurred by various criticisms and particularly the friendly but longstanding dispute with William James known as "The Battle of the Absolute." In addition, he struggled with the problem of community and the relations of the individual and community both philosophically and practically, the latter concern evidenced in his writings on the history of California, the land disputes in California, various public problems and his deep concern for a solid theory of ethics. In answer to Charles Sanders Peirce, he turned to a deep exploration of logic, mathematics, and semiotics. In his later works, Royce dispenses with the “Absolute Mind/Knower” of previous works and develops a metaphysical view which characterizes reality as a universe of ideas or signs which occur in the process of being interpreted by an ongoing, infinite community of minds. These minds and the community they constitute also become signs for further interpretation. In The Problem of Christianity he sees representation no longer as a static, one-time experience, but as having creative, synthetic and selective aspects and knowledge is now more than accurate and completed perception of an object, or complete conception of an idea, it is a process of interpretation. This new metaphysical view is reflected in Royce’s work on ethics, philosophy of religion, philosophy of community, social philosophy and logic.

a. Royce's Philosophy of Community

Royce was concerned about the impact of an extreme individualism and particularly with the “heroic individualism” associated with Walt Whitman, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and William James. Though inspiring as ethical visions, Royce believed these views eventually proved unsatisfactory for ethical life. While affirming the "individual" as a "most fundamental phenomenon," he sought to address the problem of forming satisfactory communities and dealing with competing forms of community. In his later metaphysics Royce affirms the full-fledged reality of both individuals and community. In the practical social and political realm, Royce tackled the dual issues of “enlightened/genuine individualism,” and “true/genuine community.” He recognized that the task of building authentic individuality and encouraging the growth of fulfilling, moral communities were inextricably bound together—worthwhile individuality and community arising out of their mutual interaction in a creative, ongoing, infinite process.

Thus, Royce develops the following claims: (1) individuals are inextricably rooted in the social context and true individuality is forged out of that context. An individual is both self-made and a social product and the worthiness of the end result, the individual self, is the responsibility of both individual and community; (2) community is a social product, but true community is created by the hard work of free, self-conscious, self-committed, self-creative moral individuals; (3) the task of the individual is both to fashion a “beautiful life” and to build a “beautiful” community, while the obligation of community is to build a harmony of wills while also fostering the development of true individuals; (4) individuals are finite, sinful and fallible and need to extend self to develop morality and overcome error. Furthermore, individuals crave harmony and relationship. Individuals keep communities alive, moral, and sane by keeping them from stagnating into inveterate habit, moving toward exclusivity and intolerance, or degenerating into mob madness. In other words, stress must be equally on the individual and the community. For Royce, “individuals without community are without substance, while communities without individuals are blind.”

In light of the strong individualistic emphasis in philosophy today, it is striking that for Royce communities are logically prior to individuals. For Royce, there is no personal identity unless there are communities of persons that provide causes and social roles for individuals to embrace. Royce declares: “My life means nothing, either theoretically or practically, unless I am a member of a community” (Royce 2001 [1913], 357). And community is more than any association or collection of individuals; communities can only exist, in Royce’s view, where individual members are in communication with one another and there exists to some relevant way a congruence of feeling, thought and will among them. A community is for Royce, as is the human self, a temporal being. He speaks of a community of memory and ac community of hope. Each of the community’s members accepts, as part of his/her own individual life and self, some past events and the same expected future events. And, like human selves, communities are “plans of action” engaged in purposive activity in the world and constituting a will and a spirit and, for Royce, also, like human selves, morally responsible for its communal actions.

b. Royce's Ethics: The Philosophy of Loyalty

At the center of Royce’s ethics is his contention that to lead a morally significant life, one’s actions must express a self-consciously asserted will; the self is a plan of action, a plan of life created by an individual out of the chaos of many conflicting personal desires and impulses. Such a plan is forged when one finds a cause, or causes which require a program or programs of implementation that extend through time and requires the contributions of many individuals for their advancement and fulfillment. When an individual finds a cause judged worthwhile, his/her will becomes focused and defined in terms of that cause and furthermore, the individual becomes allied with a community of others who are also committed to that same cause. Royce calls this commitment “loyalty” and thus the moral life of an individual is understood in terms of the multiple loyalties that a person embraces. “There is only one way to be an ethical individual. That is to choose your cause, and then to serve it” (Royce 1995 [l908], 47).

According to Royce’s careful definition of loyalty, “genuine” loyalty is intended to rule out loyalty to morally evil causes and communities that serve them. Royce fully recognized that many of the worst deed in human history have involved a high degree of loyalty, but, argued Royce, these loyalties were directed exclusively to a particular group and expressed in the destruction of the conditions for others’ loyal actions, Royce describes the difference between true loyalty and vicious or “predatory” loyalty as follows:

A cause is good, not only for me, but for mankind, in so far, as it is essentially a “loyalty to loyalty,” that is, an aid, and a furtherance of loyalty in my fellows. It is an evil cause in so far as, despite the loyalty that it arouses in me, it is destructive of loyalty in the world of my fellows (Royce 1995 {1908}, 56).

Communities defined by true loyalty, or adherence to a cause that exemplifies the universal ideal of “loyalty to loyalty” are referred to by Royce as “genuine communities.” Again, the degenerate communities are those that tend toward the destruction of other’s causes and possibilities of loyalty. While every community works for the accomplishment of its central cause, Royce places significant emphasis on the idea of loyalty to a “lost cause.” A lost cause is not a hopeless cause but rather one that cannot be fulfilled within the actual lifetime of any of its members. These causes are those that are “lost” simply in virtue of their scope and magnitude and these are precisely the causes that establish ideals capable of evoking our highest hope and moral commitment. “Lost causes” are indispensable, in Royce’s view, as the source of absolute norms for any community and its members.

For Royce, chief among such causes is the full attainment of truth, the complete determination of the nature of reality through inquiry and interpretation. Thus, the formula of “loyalty to loyalty” demands that one’s moral and intellectual sphere become ever broader and remain critical at all levels. In this connection, Royce reframed two central ideas or principles of pragmatism. Following James in his essay, “The Will to Believe,” Royce agreed that any philosophical view is essentially an expression of individual volition. We must first decide how we are to approach the world and then develop our philosophical theories accordingly. For Royce, the essential attitude of will that one must adopt toward the world is “loyalty to the ideal of an ultimate truth.” Secondly, Royce adopted the pragmatist view of truth, that is, truth is the property possessed by those ideas that succeed in the long run. And, following Peirce, Royce argues that to define truth using any conception of “the long run, short of the ideal end of inquiry, is self-refuting.” Having adopted these pragmatic principles, Royce referred to his own position as “Absolute Pragmatism.”

Returning to the principles of “loyalty to loyalty,” it becomes clear that, for Royce, all communities we actually know, inhabit, or identify with, are finite and to varying degrees “predatory.” Roycean loyalty requires one to scrutinize the aims and actions of our communities and those of others and to work to reform the disloyal aspects. The philosophy of loyalty calls upon us to create and embrace more cosmopolitan and inclusive communities. However, any human community, however, inclusive and committed to loyalty to loyalty, will fall short of perfect loyalty. Each community must constantly engage in critical scrutiny and actions of reform. For Royce, there is no expectation that the high ideals of perfect loyalty, truth, and reality will ever be fully realized. The process of building community is an ongoing, infinite process.

Finally, for Royce, beyond the actual communities that we directly encounter in life there is the ideal “Beloved Community” of all those who would be fully dedicated to the cause of loyalty, truth, and reality itself. This is the ultimate goal and cause. Furthermore, the sharing of individuals’ feeling, thoughts and wills in a community (including the Beloved Community) is never, for Royce, a mystical blurring or annihilation of personal identities. Individuals remain individuals, but in forming a community they build or attain a second order life that extends beyond any of their individuals lives. This life is a life coordinated through a cause and extended over time, a super-human personality at work, a community united by an “interpreting spirit.” Again, communities are more than their individual members and individuals are always unique and not lost in their communities; individuals and communities need each other.

c. Religion

Through the strong influence of his mother, Sarah Royce, and the early education she provided him and his sisters, Royce was well acquainted with the Christian Protestant world view and his writings exhibited a consistent familiarity with Scripture and with religious themes. Royce, in his own life did not embrace organized Christianity, and he was critical of many historical churches, believing that they had lost sight of the “spirit” of community that ought to guide them. He identified many “communities of grace,” genuine communities of loyalty, that were non-Christian or not self-consciously religious. Royce had a great respect for Buddhism and he even learned Sanskrit to study religious texts in this language. Although Royce maintained a strong interest in logic, science, evolutionary theory, and natural philosophy throughout his career, religious concerns did figure prominently in a number of his works beginning with his first major publication, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy as well as in his last two major works, The Sources of Religious Insight and The Problem of Christianity. The Sources was Royce’s response to the Gifford Lectures delivered by William James in 1901-1902 and published as The Varieties of Religious experience. James’ lectures were a popular and academic success and remain so even today. Royce, however, believed that James placed too much emphasis on the extraordinary religious experience of extraordinary individuals and thus failed to capture the religious experiences of the ordinary individual. Furthermore, Royce believed that religion was a central phenomenon of human experience that could not be ignored by philosophers. In The Problem of Christianity Royce works out his own religious thought and his full-blown theory of community. He maintains that the Christian model of the “loyal community,” properly understood, successfully combined the true spirit of universal interpretation with an appreciation of the “infinite worth” of the individual as a unique member of the ideal Beloved Community, the Kingdom of Heaven (Royce 2001[1913], 193). It is in this book that Royce also brings to fruition his thought and concern with the problem of evil.

Royce’s approach to religion was empirical, historical and phenomenological as well as concerned with philosophical reflection. Thus, in a 1909 essay, “What is Vital in Christianity?,” Royce approaches religion with a historic-empirical approach akin to modern anthropology. He views the religion as it has developed within human history. He writes: “any religion presents itself as a more or less connected group: (1) of religious practices, such as prayers, ceremonies, festivals, rituals and other observance, and (2) of religious ideas, the ideas taking the form of traditions, legends, and beliefs about the gods or spirits” (Royce 1911 [1909], 101). The term “vital,” says Royce, is metaphoric, such as the “vital” features of an organism. If these changed the organism would not necessarily be destroyed but would be an essentially different type of organism. Royce illustrates with the features, gill breathing” and “lung breathing.” But “vital,” also connotes “alive” for the persons who are followers of the religion and this usage is similar to Paul Tillich’s understanding of religious symbols as alive or dying. Furthermore, this term means also “primary” in practice. Thus, Royce says his first question is: “What is more vital about a religion: its religious practices, or its religious ideas, beliefs, and spiritual attitudes?” In this essay, in a humorous passage about pigeons in the Harvard Yard observing the habits of humans who feed them and concluding to the existence of a benevolent creator, Royce critiques the causal approach to God, represented in many of the proofs for God’s existence.

Royce again approaches religion through a historical-philosophical analysis in an encyclopedia article entitled “Monotheism.” After briefly reviewing monotheism as a doctrine in contrast to polytheism and pantheism, Royce makes the following claim: “…from the historical point of view, three different ways of viewing the divine being have been of great importance both for religious life and for philosophical doctrine” (Royce 1916, 818). The three ways to which Royce refers are three forms of monotheism, which were established in India, Greece, and Israel.

Royce then discusses, what in his view, are the essential features of monotheism as developed in these three cultural contexts. From Israel, we have “the ethical monotheism of the Prophets of Israel,” and “God,” in this religious context is defined as “the righteous Ruler of the world,” as the “Doer of justice,” or as the one “whose law is holy” or “who secures the triumph of the right”(Royce, 1916). Turning to Greece and to “Hellenistic monotheism,” God is defined as the “source, of the explanation, or the correlate, or the order, or the reasonableness of the world” (Royce, 1916). The third type of monotheism is labeled “Hindu pantheism.” Royce notes that this understanding had many different historical origins and appeared, in fact, as part of the Neo-Platonic philosophy and the philosophy of Spinoza. This type of monotheism insists not only upon the “sole” reality of God, but also asserts the “unreality of the world” (Royce, 1916).

In an interesting move, Royce argues that the “whole history of Christian monotheism depends upon an explicit effort to make a synthesis of the ethical monotheism of Israel and the Hellenic form of monotheism (Royce, 1916) This effort, however, says Royce, has proven especially difficult. The Hellenic tradition with its intellectualistic emphasis on the Logos was in favor of defining the unity of the divine being and the world as the essential feature of monotheism, whereas ethical monotheism dwells upon the contrast between the righteous Ruler and the sinful world, and between divine grace and fallen man. Royce, then, concludes:

Therefore, behind many of the conflicts between the so-called pantheism in Christian tradition and the doctrines of “divine transcendence” and “divine personality,” there has lain the conflict between intellectualism and voluntarism, between an interpretation of the world in terms of order and an interpretation of the world in terms of the conflict between good and evil, righteousness and unrighteousness (Royce, 1916, 819).

This history is made even more complex, says Royce, due to the influence of the Indic type of God. This concept influenced mysticism and, of course, Neo-platonic philosophy which, in turn, influenced Christian philosophy and theology. Augustine is a prime example of this influence. Furthermore, within Christianity, the mystics have often pointed to the failure to resolve the conflict with the moral and intellectual interests. Royce writes:

The mystics…have always held that the results of the intellect are negative and lead to no definite idea of God which can be defended against the skeptics, while…to follow the law of righteousness, whether or not with the aid of divine grace, does not lead, at least in the present life, to the highest type of knowledge of God (Royce, 1916).

Then, Royce, with his respect for the experiential in religion, writes: “Without this third type of monotheism, and without this negative criticism of the work of the intellect, and this direct appeal to immediate experience, Christian doctrine, in fact, would not have reached some of its most characteristic forms and expressions, and the philosophy of Christendom would have failed to put on record some of its most fascinating speculations" (Royce, 1916).

Royce then reviews the history of the so-called “proofs for God’s existence,” generally an expression of the Hellenistic influence in Christianity, and says that there is some basis in the claim that these efforts to grasp the divine nature via the intellect leads to results remote “from the vital experience upon which religious monotheism, and in particular, Christian monotheism must rest, if such…is permanently to retain the confidence of a man who is at once critical and religious (Royce, 1916).

Finally, it is not surprising that Royce argues that whatever answers to the questions about the nature of the world – is it real, rational, ethical? – that are developed must not put exclusive emphasis on any one characteristic. For, “as we have seen, the problem of monotheism requires a synthesis of all the three ideas of God,” thus any attempt to address these three questions must be an answer that does adequate justice to the three ideas and the three problems (Royce, 1916). Royce’s own efforts were aimed at achieving this synthesis and providing an answer to these three questions. Thus, he sought in his conceptions of God to give an account of the nature of reality that would satisfy the “moral insight,” “the theoretic insight,” and the “religious insight.” And the three Conceptions of Being addressed in The World and the Individual embody aspects of the three ideas of God and address the three questions.

Turning now to The Sources of Religious Insight, as indicated earlier, it is a parallel to The Varieties of Religious Experience by William James, yet it transcends that work in a number of ways. First, it explores religious experience common to much of mankind rather than the special, genius cases that are the subject of James’ work. Second, it studies both individual and communal religious experience whereas James’ work focuses on the experiences of extraordinary individuals. Third, The Sources is solidly based in the empirical and experiential. Royce writes: “The issue will be one regarding the facts of living experience” (Royce, 1912). James, in his work seeks to explain man’s religious need in terms of an experience that wells up from the subliminal self, from the soundless depths of our own subconscious. Royce, on the other hand, asserts that, “the principal religious motives are indeed perfectly natural human motives” (Royce, 1912,41-42). Man’s religious experience is, as a natural process, an incident in the history of his sensitive life, of his personal interpretation of the world, and of his more or less creative effort to fulfill his needs, and to respond in his own way to the universe. Religious experience, then, for Royce, is natural and profoundly personal and social - it is the experience of a human self in the history of his own life, set in the material, historical, social, and cultural context of that individual history and life.

Beginning then with human experience and needs, Royce seeks to get at the heart of “religious experience.” He states that the “central and essential postulate” of every religion is that “man needs to be saved” (Royce 2001[1912], 8-9). Salvation is necessary, for Royce, for two reasons: (1) There is some aim or end of human life which is more important than all other aims; and (2) Man, as he now is, or is naturally, is always in great danger of missing this highest aim and thus to render his whole life “a senseless failure” (Royce 2001 [1912], 12). This salvation must come in the form of guidance about understanding and achieving the highest aim of life so far as one is able. But given the limitations and fallibility of the human perspective, which hardly extends “beyond one’s nose,” Royce contends that this needed guidance must come from some super-human source. Religion, then, is the sphere of life in which finite human beings are able to get in touch with this source. It is interesting that in seeking to demonstrate the validity of his postulate he reviews the essentials of Buddhism, the writings of Plato in The Republic, and various literary sources. He believes that these examples show that the search for salvation belongs to no “one type of piety or of poetry or of philosophy” (Royce, 1912, 15).

The next major question is “what are the sources of insight?” Royce will consider seven sources, beginning with the human self, viewed first as uniquely individual and then as social. These are the basic and most elementary. However, Royce will find individual life and social life insufficient to meet the religious need for salvation. He then turns to five other sources. These are all dependent on the first two sources but will develop, strengthen, correct and transform in some way these. The five are: reason as a synthesizing power; the will or the volitional; loyalty; the religious mission of sorrow, and the unified community of the spirit.

In turning to the individual alone with his problem of salvation and with his efforts to know the divine that can save, Royce asserts that the individual can be in touch with a genuine source of insight, one of value, although also a source with limits. There are, says Royce, three objects which individual experience, as a source of religious insight, can reveal: The Ideal, the Need, and the Deliverer. The Ideal is, of course, the standard in terms of which the individual estimates the sense and value of his personal life. The Need for salvation is that degree to which he falls short of attaining his ideal and is sundered from this Ideal by evil fortune, his own paralysis of will, or by his inward baseness. The Deliverer is that presence, that power, that light, that truth, that great companion who helps the individual and saves him from his need.

We as humans are creatures of wavering and conflicting motives and, although we strongly desire a unity that makes life meaningful, we, on our own, cannot find this unity; we always miss our mark. Furthermore, we have glimpses of what would fulfill us, what would meet our need: a life “infinitely richer than our own.” As James, argues, we want to get in touch with something that will give us a “new dimension” to our lives. We want something more. Furthermore, for Royce, our need and desire are crucial. Royce writes: “Unless you have inwardly felt the need of salvation and learned to hunger and thirst after spiritual unity and self-possession, all the rest of religious insight is to you a sealed book” (Royce 1912, 33).

However, the individual alone cannot achieve what is needed. Thus we must turn to the social and to shared human life to attain a broader religious insight. Royce writes: “…no one who remains content with his merely individual experience of the presence of the divine and of his deliverer, has won the whole of any true insight. For as a fact, we are all members one of another; and I can have no insight into the way of my salvation unless I thereby learn of the way of salvation for all my brethren. And there is no unity of the spirit unless all men are privileged to enter it whenever they see it and know it and love it” (Royce, 1912, 34). Here is Royce’s emphasis on the need for social expansion of the self, as loyalty to loyalty demands expansion of the perspective of the community. Indeed, Royce argues that one of the principal sources of our need for salvation is our narrowness of view and especially of the meaning of our own purposes and motives. The social world, as Royce has constantly argued, broadens our outlook; an individual corrects his own narrowness by trying to share his fellow’s point of view. Social responsibilities can set limits to our fickleness; social discipline can keep us from indulging all our caprices; human companionship may steady our vision. The social world may bring us in touch with our public, great self, wherein we may find our “soul and its interests writ large” (Royce, 1912, 55). Social life is a source of religious insight and the insight it can bring is knowledge of “salvation through the fostering of human brotherhood” (Royce, 1912, 58).

Another avenue to religious insight, for Royce, is the experience of moral suffering, of the deep sense of guilt accompanied by the belief that one is an outcast from human sympathy and is hopelessly alone. He illustrates this with two literary examples: “The Ancient Mariner” and Raskolnikov in Crime and Punishment. The central conception in these two literary pieces is of salvation as reconciliation both with the social and the divine order, an escape from the wilderness of lonely guilt to the realm where men can understand one another.

This brings us directly to the “religious mission of sorrow.” Sorrows are defined by Royce as evils that we can assimilate. These become part of a constructive process, which involves growth rather than destruction, a passage to a new life. We takes these sorrows up into our plan of life, give them new meaning as they become part of a new whole. This was Royce’s emphasis in his essays on the problem of evil as well as in Religious Aspect and The Spirit. This will be discussed more in the section on the Problem of Evil.

The stage is now set for The Problem of Christianity. Christianity is viewed as a “philosophy of life,” and the question Royce asks is “In what sense, if any, can the modern man consistently be, in creed, a Christian?” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 62). In focusing on “creed,” however, Royce is clear that he is not concerned here with dogma or with particular theological beliefs. Rather he seeks the essentially “vital” and living ideas that will find expression in communal practices and religious-moral living and that will speak to all humanity. Royce will focus on living religious experience as was expressed in the early Pauline Christian communities. Royce’s focus is on the incarnation of the Spirit in the living Church, it is the Church, rather than the person of the founder that is the central idea of Christianity. For Royce, the essence of Christianity is its stress on the “saving community.” Royce writes: “The thesis of this book is that the essence of Christianity, as the Apostle Paul stated that essence, depends upon regarding the being which the early Christian Church believed itself to represent, and the being which I call…the ‘Beloved Community,’ as the true source, through loyalty, of the salvation of man” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 45).

It is indeed the “community” which allows us to understand more fully the teachings of the Master. Of Jesus’ teaching, Royce found two ideas especially crucial: his preaching of love and the “Kingdom of Heaven.” Both were mysterious and in need of interpretation. Thus, “love” is a mystery for although we know we are to love God and our neighbor, the question is how. How can I be practically useful in meeting my neighbor’s needs? Anyone who has tried to be benevolent or to meet the needs of others knows that there can be a huge crevice between your interpretation of what that person needs and their belief in that matter. It is the interpretation of Jesus’ teachings in the letters of Paul that make the difference for Royce. That which can make the loving of our neighbor less mysterious and difficult is community, for a community “when united by an active developing purpose is an entity more concrete, and, in fact, less mysterious than any individual man (Royce, 2001 [1913] 94). In community, we can come to know each other, to see what each other’s needs are. I need not ask “who is my neighbor?” for my neighbor and I are both members of one and the same community.

The essence of Christianity, for Royce, is contained in three ideas. The first of these is that the source and means of salvation is the community of believers. Community is also the basis of the ethic of love taught by Jesus. The other two essential ideas are: “the moral burden of the individual and “atonement.” These are addressed in the section on evil.

d. The Problem of Evil

Josiah Royce struggled with the problem of evil throughout his life, exploring it from various approaches, and asserting that it could neither be avoided nor dismissed by either the philosopher or the ordinary person. Thus, unlike some philosophers, he did not believe the problem of evil could be solved as a practical problem that only required improving social conditions. As a native Californian, a historian, and a social observer of the development of early California, Royce explored ways in which evil manifested itself in social relations among persons, in social bodies infected with racism, greed, and in a variety of harmful prejudices, in expressions of hate and in mob violence. Ultimately, Royce embraced a theistic process metaphysics that recognizes evil as a real force and suffering as an irreducible fact of experience. In his 1897 essay, “The Problem of Job,” Royce presents a fairly succinct overview of the problem of evil, various solutions and his own view on a possible solution. In the Job story, we have a traditional view of God as wise, omnipotent, all powerful, and all good and the situation of Job, namely, a universal situation of unearned ill-fortune, a seeming persecution of a righteous person and a reigning down of evils on a good man. For Royce, Job represents the fundamental psychological fact about the problem of evil, namely, the universal experience of unearned ill-fortune. This, asserts Royce, is the experience of every person, the kind of evil that all persons can see for themselves every day if they choose. This is the fundamental experiential and psychological fact that grounds Royce’s own answers to the problem of evil and also his dismissal of the various traditional answers to the problem of evil. Thus, for example there is the view that the purpose of the world is “soul making,” that pain teaches us the ways of the world and helps us develop our higher potentialities. Royce believes this answer is inadequate because it presupposes a greater evil, namely a world which allows evils as the only way to reach given goals. Such an answer Royce believes is unacceptable to a sufferer of evil and undeserved ills.

Another answer to the problem of evil is the infinite worth of agents with free will. Royce finds value in this view in that it acknowledges evil as a logically necessary part of a perfect moral order, but he believes this answer ultimately fails. A major problem is Job’s situation, namely, the innocent sufferer. Such unearned ills may be partly due to the free will that partly caused them, but, asserts Royce, the unearned ills are also due to God who declines to protect the innocent.

Royce believes that as long as one views God as an external power, as Job did, the problem of evil cannot be solved. Rather, one must recognize God as internally present to us and as suffering with us to produce the higher good. When we suffer, our sufferings are God’s sufferings and this is the case because without suffering, evil, and tragedy, God’s life could not be perfected. Furthermore, asserts Royce, personal overcoming evil is the essence of the moral life. Persons are instruments of God’s triumph. Thus, in The Sources of Religious Insight, Royce presents man as a destroyer of evil, a being who uses every effort to get rid of evil. Conquering evils and oppressions provide man’s greatest opportunities for loyalty and here is the source of religious insight and spiritual triumph. The encounter of human selves with the problem of evil is, for Royce, the most important moral aspect of the world. One must see the problematic situation into which human selves are immersed as part of the atoning process which tends toward an ultimate reconciliation of finite conflicts. Confronted with evils, one needs to trust within one’s limited view that the Spirit of the Universal Community reconciles.

Ultimately, Royce sees evil as an eternal part of both human and divine consciousness and the most important moral fact of the universe the human conquering of evil step by step. In addressing the doctrine of atonement in The Problem, Royce sets out in detail how the loyal community can best respond to human evil. The highest transgression in an ethics of loyalty is treason, or the willful betrayal of one’s own cause and the community of people who serve it. Such a betrayal is moral suicide for it threatens to destroy the network of purposes and social relationships that define the traitor’s self. The traitor is in what Royce calls “the hell of the irrevocable” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 162). Royce seeks an explanation of atonement which acknowledges this irrevocable nature of the deed that has been done, and which changes everything for the sinner and the community that has been harmed. None of the tradition Christian accounts of atonement are satisfactory. The answer, for Royce, is that the act of atonement can only be accomplished by the community, or on the behalf of the community, through the steadfast “loyal servant who acts, so to speak, as the incarnation of the spirit of the community itself” (Royce, 2011 [1913], 180). This person serves as a mediating party between the traitor and the betrayed community and through the atoning act genuine community is restored and all the individuals may emerge as wiser, more commitment servants of their common cause. Things are not the same as before the treason but, in fact, transformed and better. Royce then states what he believes to be the central postulate of the highest form of human spirituality, namely, that “No baseness or cruelty of treason so deep or so tragic shall enter our human world, but that loyal love shall be able in due time to oppose to just that deed of treason its fitting deed of atonement” (Royce 2001 [1913], 186). In the spirit of James, Royce asserts that this postulate cannot be proven true, but human communities can assert it and act upon it as it is were true.

e. Logic

Royce pursued his interest in logic, mathematics and science throughout his career. His first published book was a Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, written for his students in California in 1881. His own proposal for a system of formal logic was published as “The Relation of the Principles of Logic to the Foundations of Geometry” in 1905, a work later extended in 1914. Among his last writings were a series of encyclopedia articles on logical topics: Axiom, Error and Truth, Mind, Negation, and Order (all reprinted in Robinson, 1951).

In addition to his discussion of science in The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, The World and the Individual, and in The Problem of Christianity, Royce published a series of articles on scientific method:” The Mechanical, Historical and the Statistical,” “The Social Character of Scientific Inquiry,” (in Josiah Royce’s Late Writings); Hypotheses and Leading Ideas,” and Introduction to H. Poincaré, The Foundations of Science (reprinted in Robinson). Like Peirce, Royce argued for the self-corrective nature of the scientific method; the necessity of experience as the starting point of inquiry; an emphasis on scientific instinct and imaginative judgment in forming hypotheses; the requirement of a proper motive - the search for truth and not fame or profit - as a necessary condition, along with the correct method, for the success of science and essence of science, the notion of science as a communal endeavor, dependent on the contributions of many others, past, present and future, and finally for the thoroughly human and fallible nature of science.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Royce, Josiah, Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, San Francisco, California: A.L. Bancroft and Co., 1881.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy: A critique of the Bases of Conduct and Faith, Boston, New York: Houghton Mifflin & Co., 1885.
  • Royce, Josiah, California from the Conquest in 1846 to the Second Vigilance Committee in San Francisco [1856]: A Study of American Character, Boston and New York: Houghton, Mifflin and Co. 1886.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Spirit of Modern Philosophy: An Essay in the Form of Lectures, Boston: Houghton Mifflin, 1892.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Conception of God: A Philosophical Discussion Concerning the Nature of the Divine Idea as a Demonstrable Reality, New York: The Macmillan Co, 1897. This includes commentary by Joseph LeConte, George Holmes Howison, and Sidney Edward Mezes.
  • Royce, Josiah, Studies in Good and Evil, New York, Appleton, 1898.
  • Royce, Josiah, The World and the Individual, 2 vols., New York: Macmillan, 1899.
  • Royce, Josiah, Outlines of Psychology: An Elementary Treatise with Some Practical Applications, New York: Macmillan, 1903.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Philosophy of Loyalty, New York: Macmillan, 1908.
  • Royce, Josiah, Race Questions, Provincialism, and Other American Problems, New York: Macmillan, 1908.
  • Royce, Josiah, William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, New York: Macmillan, 1911.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Sources of Religious Insight, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2001 [1913].
  • Royce, Josiah, The Problem of Christianity, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2001 [1913].
  • Royce, Josiah, War and Insurance, New York: Macmillan, 1914.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Hope of the Great Community, New York: Macmillan, 1916.

b. Published Editions

  • Robinson, D.S., ed. Royce’s Logical Essays: Collected Logical Essays of Josiah Royce, Dubuque, Iowa: W. C. Brown, 1951.
  • McDermott, J.J., ed. The Basic Writings of Josiah Royce, New York: Fordham University Press, 2 vols., 2005 [1969].
  • Clendenning, J., Ed. The Letters of Josiah Royce, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1970.
  • Oppenheim, F., ed. Josiah Royce’s Late Writings: A Collection of Unpublished and Scattered Works, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2 vols.

c. Secondary Sources

  • Auxier, R, ed., Critical Responses to Josiah Royce, 1885-1916, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 3 vols., 2000.
  • Auxier, R, Time, Will, and Purpose: Living Ideas From the Philosophy of Josiah Royce, Open Court, 2011.
  • Clendenning, The Life and Thought of Josiah Royce, revised and expanded ed., Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press, 1999.
  • Kegley, J., Genuine Individuals and Genuine Communities: A Roycean Public Philosophy, Nashville, Tennessee, 1997.
  • Kegley, J. Josiah Royce in Focus, Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press, 2008.
  • Kiklick, B., Josiah Royce: An Intellectual Biography, Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1985.
  • Marcel, G., Royce’s Metaphysics, trans. V. and G. Ringer, Chicago: Henry Regnery Company, 1956. This was originally published as La Mėtaphysique de Royce, Paris, 1945.
  • Oppenheim, F.M. Royce’s Voyage Down Under: A Journey of the Mind, Lexington: University of Kentucky Press, 1980.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Royce’s Mature Philosophy of Religion, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1987.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Royce’s Mature Ethics, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Reverence for the Relations of Life: Re-examining Pragmatism via Josiah Royce’s Interactions with Peirce, James, and Dewey, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 2005.
  • Smith, J.E. Royce South Infinite: The Community of Interpretation, Hamden, Conn.: Archon Books, 1969.
  • Tunstall, Dwayne, Yes, but Not Quite: Encountering Josiah Royce’s Ethico-Religious Insight, New York: Fordham University Press, 2009.
  • Trotter, G., On Royce, Belmont, California: Wadsworth, 2001.

Author Information

Jacquelyn Ann K. Kegley
Email: jkegley@csub.edu
California State University Bakersfield
U. S. A.

William James (1842-1910)

William James is considered by many to be the most insightful and stimulating of American philosophers, as well as the second of the three great pragmatists (the middle link between Charles Sanders Peirce and John Dewey).  As a professor of psychology and of philosophy at Harvard University, he became the most famous living American psychologist and later the most famous living American philosopher of his time.  Avoiding the logically tight systems typical of European rationalists, such as the German idealists, he cobbled together a psychology rich in philosophical implications and a philosophy enriched by his psychological expertise.  More specifically, his theory of the self and his view of human belief as oriented towards conscious action raised issues that required him to turn to philosophy.  There he developed his pragmatic epistemology, which considers the meaning of ideas and the truth of beliefs not abstractly, but in terms of the practical difference they can make in people’s lives.  He explored the implications of this theory in areas of religious belief, metaphysics, human freedom and moral values, and social philosophy. His contributions in these areas included critiques of long-standing philosophical positions on such issues as freedom vs. determinism, correspondence vs. coherence, and dualism vs. materialism, as well as a thorough analysis of a phenomenological understanding of the self and consciousness, a “forward-looking” conception of truth (based on validation and revisable experience), a thorough-going metaphysical pluralism, and a commitment to a full view of agency in connection with communal and social concerns. Thus he created one of the last great philosophical systems in Western thought, even if he did not live quite long enough to complete every aspect of it. The combination of his provocative ideas and his engaging writing style has contributed to the enduring impact of his work.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Philosophical Psychology
    1. The Stream of Consciousness and the Self
    2. Sensation, Perception, Imagination, and Belief
    3. Emotion and Will
  3. Epistemology
    1. The Pragmatic Method
    2. The Pragmatic Theory of Truth
    3. The Pragmatic Approach to Belief
  4. Philosophy of Religion
    1. The Will to Believe in God
    2. The Varieties of Religious Experience
    3. James’s Own Religious Views
  5. Metaphysics
    1. Realms of Reality
    2. The Philosophical Importance of Metaphysics
    3. Monism vs. Pluralism
  6. Freedom and Morality
    1. Human Freedom
    2. Moral Responsibility
    3. The Meaningfulness of Life
  7. Social Philosophy
    1. Individuals and Their Communities
    2. War and Peace
    3. Democratic Tolerance and Social Progress
  8. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

Born in New York City on January 11, 1842, William James was the oldest of the five children of Henry James, Sr., and Mary Walsh James.  His oldest brother, Henry James, Jr., the renowned writer of fiction, was followed by two other brothers and a sister.  The family frequently moved between America and Europe, the father having inherited an amount of money sufficient to allow him to enjoy the life of an intellectual.  While growing up, William had a passion for drawing.  Since he wanted to become a painter, the family moved to Newport, Rhode Island in 1860, where William studied with the leading American portraitist, William Morris Hunt.  Although he had talent, he gave up this career goal in less than a year.  He had decided that it was insufficient for him to do first-rate work.  All this is indicative of three things:  the family’s remarkable support for his aspirations; his own quest to achieve excellence; and his restless, indecisive difficulty in remaining committed to a career path.

In 1861, the American Civil War erupted.  In response to President Lincoln’s call for volunteers, James committed himself to a short-term enlistment.  However, already in delicate health, he left when it expired after three months.  (His younger brothers Wilky and Bob served in the Union Army.)  He then enrolled in the Lawrence Scientific School at Harvard University, his family moving to Boston.  There he studied chemistry and then physiology, prior to his entering Harvard’s Medical School in 1863.  A couple of years later, he took a year off to join a scientific expedition to Brazil, led by Louis Agassiz.  But bad health eventually forced him to quit the expedition, and he returned to medical school (the James family moving from Boston to Cambridge, Massachusetts).   Again he left, this time to study physiology and medicine in Germany and to recover his health.  He failed to find a cure for his curious back pains, but returned to Harvard, passed his medical exams, and received his medical degree in 1869.  Nevertheless, he did not plan to practice medicine and seemed lost as to what to do with the rest of his life.

By the end of that same year, James’s neurological symptoms had become worse.  His training in hard science was making it impossible for him to believe in human freedom and, thus, in the value of struggling for moral ideals; the despair of materialism was leading him to the depression of determinism.  In a barely disguised case history in his Varieties of Religious Experience, he tells of visiting an asylum while he was a medical student, and seeing an epileptic patient whose condition had reduced him to an idiotic state.  James could not dispel the realization that if universal determinism prevails, he could likewise sink into such a state, utterly incapable of preventing it (Varieties, pp. 135-136).  His dread over the sense of life’s absolute insecurity pushed him to become a virtual invalid in his parents’ home.  He considered suicide.  By the spring of 1870, when James was twenty-eight years old, he experienced a critical moment while reading a treatment of human freedom by the French neo-Kantian Charles Renouvier.  He discovered the solution to his problem in the voluntaristic act of will whereby he could commit himself to believing in his own freedom despite any lack of objective evidence.  He started down the road to recovery, though the remainder of his life would be plagued by seemingly psychosomatic troubles (serious eye strain, mysterious back pains, digestive problems, and periods of exhaustion, as well as chronic mood swings, including times of brooding depression).  Unfortunately, he still lacked a constructive career goal.

In 1872, one of James’s former chemistry professors, now Harvard’s President, offered him a job teaching physiology.  He accepted and began his career of more than a third of a century as a faculty member there.  The next year, he became an instructor of anatomy and physiology.  By the mid-eighteen-seventies, he was teaching psychology there, using the physiological approach he had learned in Germany and establishing the first psychology laboratory in America.  He met a schoolteacher named Alice Howe Gibbens, whom he married in 1878.  Like his parents, they had five children, naming the first two Henry and William.  Alice was adept at handling his neurotic obsessions and emotional moodiness, and they seem to have had a good marriage, living comfortably in Cambridge.  The year they married, James agreed to write a psychology textbook; however, by then he was already drifting away from psychology into philosophy.  He was a member of a Metaphysical Club that included Oliver Wendell Holmes, who taught law at Harvard and would go on to serve on the U. S. Supreme Court, and Charles Sanders Peirce, a philosopher of science, who would become the founder of American pragmatism.  In 1879, James began teaching philosophy at Harvard, becoming an assistant professor of philosophy the next year.  He published “The Sentiment of Rationality,” his first important article in his new discipline.  As he got deeper into philosophy, he developed a negative attitude towards psychology.  After becoming a full professor of philosophy in 1885 and of psychology in 1889, he published his Principles of Psychology in 1890.  It had taken him close to twelve years to finish it, and, though it would be extremely successful, he was dissatisfied with it and disgusted with psychology (Letters, vol. 1, pp. 294, 296, & vol. 2, pp. 2-3).  Nevertheless, he agreed to prepare an abridged version, which was published two years later as Psychology:  Briefer Course; it too would be widely used and help to establish his reputation as the foremost living American psychologist.  He resigned his directorship of Harvard’s psychology lab and committed himself to teaching and writing philosophy.

In 1897, James’s first philosophical book, The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, was published, dedicated to Charles Sanders Peirce.  The following year, at the University of California at Berkeley, he delivered a lecture, “Philosophical Conceptions and Practical Results,” which helped to launch pragmatism as a nationwide philosophical movement.  In 1899, his Talks to Teachers on Psychology and to Students on Some of Life’s Ideals was published.  Overworked at Harvard and jeopardizing his fragile health, he suffered a physical breakdown that same year.  While recovering his health, he studied a wide range of accounts of religious experience and prepared his Gifford Lectures, which he delivered at the University of Edinburgh in 1901-02.  These were published as The Varieties of Religious Experience in 1902 and proved to be quite successful, although James himself was displeased, believing them to contain too much reporting on facts and too little philosophical analysis.

For the remainder of his life, James focused on the development of his own philosophy, writing essays and lectures that would later be collected and published in four books.  In the spring of 1906, he took a leave of absence from Harvard to take a visiting professorship at Stanford University, though his lecture series in California was interrupted by the great San Francisco earthquake.  In late 1906 and early 1907, he delivered his lectures on Pragmatism in Boston and at Columbia University, publishing them in the spring of 1907.  That was also the year he resigned from Harvard, worried that he might die before being able to complete his philosophical system, as he was suffering from angina and shortness of breath.  He delivered the Hibbert Lectures in England in 1908, published the next year as A Pluralistic Universe, aimed at combating the neo-Hegelian idealism that was then prevalent in Great Britain.  Meanwhile, he was under intellectual assault by mainstream philosophers for his pragmatic treatment of truth, which he defended in a collection of essays published in 1909 as The Meaning of Truth.

By the next year, James’s heart trouble left him so plagued by fatigue that normal activities became quite difficult.  He was attempting to complete his textbook on Some Problems of Philosophy, but died on August 26, 1910.  In 1911, his textbook, edited by his son Henry, and his Memories and Studies were posthumously published.  In 1912, his Essays in Radical Empiricism was published, followed, in 1920, by some of his Collected Essays and Reviews and The Letters of William James, edited in two volumes by his son Henry.  His writings have survived in part because of the provocative honesty of his ideas, but also because of the vibrant, sometimes racy, style in which he expressed them.  In A Pluralistic Universe, he castigates philosophers who use technical jargon instead of clear, straightforward language.  He practiced the spontaneous thinking and freshness of expression he advocates there (Universe, pp. 129-130).  It has been said (by the novelist Rebecca West) that, while Henry James wrote fiction as though it were philosophy, his older brother, William, wrote philosophy in a colorful style typical of fiction.

2. Philosophical Psychology

By the early 1890s, when James published his two books on psychology, the discipline was in the process of splitting off from philosophical speculation (“psychology” literally means  “the study of the soul”) to establish itself as an empirical social science.  Despite impatience with the process of that development, he contributed significantly to moving it along, regarding psychology as the science of our mental phenomena or states of consciousness, such as thoughts, feelings, desires, volitions, and so forth.

a. The Stream of Consciousness and the Self

In analyzing what can broadly be termed human thinking, James delineates five generic characteristics:  (1) all thought is owned by some personal self; (2) all thought, as experienced by human consciousness, is constantly in flux and never static; (3) nevertheless, there is an ongoing continuity of thought for every thinker, as it moves from one object to another (like the alternating times of flight and perching in a bird’s life), constantly comprising shifting foci and the contextual fringes within which they are given; (4) thought typically deals with objects different from and independent of consciousness itself, so that two minds can experience common objects; and (5) consciousness takes an interest in particular objects, choosing to focus on them rather than on others (Principles, vol. 1, pp. 224-226, 236-237, 239, 243, 258-259, 271-272, 284; Psychology, pp. 152-154, 157-160, 166-167, 170).  The self can be viewed as an object of thought or as the subject of thought.  The former is the empirical self or “me,” while the latter is the pure ego or “I.”  The dimensions of the empirical self (“me”) include the “material” self (comprised of one’s body and such extensions of it as one’s clothing, immediate family, and home), the “social” self (or significant interpersonal relations), and the “spiritual” self (one’s personality, character, and defining values).  The pure ego (“I”), identifiable with the soul of traditional metaphysics, cannot be an object of science and should not be assumed to be a substance (Principles, vol. 1, pp. 291-294, 296, 319, 343-344, 348, 350; Psychology, pp. 176-181, 194, 196, 198, 200, 202-203, 215-216).

b. Sensation, Perception, Imagination, and Belief

James states that if we track the dynamic of mental activity, we discern a standard pattern from sensation to perception to imagination to belief.  Through sensation, we become acquainted with some given fact.  This can, but need not, lead to knowledge about that fact, achieved by perceiving its relations to other given facts.  Both sensation and perception involve an immediate intuition of some given objects.  Imagination, less immediate, retrieves mental copies of past sensations and perceptions, even when their external stimuli are no longer present.  Belief is the sense or feeling that ideas or propositions formed in the imagination correspond to reality.  Every proposition can be analyzed in terms of its object and whether that object is believed.  The object of a proposition comprises a subject (such as my horse), a predicate (wings), and a relation between them (my horse has sprouted wings).  The belief is the psychic attitude a mind has towards that object (for example, I believe it or deny it or am in doubt about it) (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 1-3, 44, 76-77, 82-83, 283-284, 287-290; Psychology, pp. 12-14, 302, 312, 316-317).

c. Emotion and Will

Like other animals, we have primitive instincts, such as fear, some desires, and certain forms of sympathy, which do not require being taught them or consciously focusing on ends.  However, we also have emotions that are learned behavior and do involve such a focus—for example, a fear of failure and the desire for an academic degree.  Instincts and emotions thus overlap, the latter tending to cover a broader range of objects than the former.  We tend to assume that perceptions trigger emotional responses, eventuating in bodily expressions—that we suddenly see a bear, become frightened, and then tremble and run away.  But James thinks the actual sequence is perception, followed by bodily expressions, followed by emotional feeling—that we see the bear, tremble and run away, then feel those physical events as what we call fear.  The idea that emotions ultimately have physical causes emphasizes the intimate relationship between our bodies and our mental life (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 383, 410, 442, 449-453, 467; Psychology, pp. 391, 375-376, 378-381).

The human will is crucial for deliberately acting on our beliefs and emotions.  Sometimes we consider alternative courses of action and seem to select one among them, as if making a voluntary decision.  James maps out five sorts of decision-making:  (1) the reasonable sort, whereby we accede to rational arguments; (2) the sort that is triggered by external circumstances, such as overhearing a rumor; (3) the sort that is prompted by our submission to something within ourselves, such as a habit formed by past actions; (4) the sort that results from a sudden change of mood such as might be caused by a feeling of grief; and (5) the rare sort that is a consequence of our own voluntary choice, which will be identified as the “will to believe.”  Whether we have free will or not is a metaphysical issue that cannot be scientifically determined (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 486-488, 528, 531-534, 572-573; Psychology, pp. 415, 419-420, 428-434, 456-457).

3. Epistemology

Even if philosophically interesting matters such as freedom vs. determinism cannot be scientifically resolved, some sort of epistemological methodology is needed if we are to avoid arbitrary conclusions.  Whatever approach is chosen, it is clear that James repudiates rationalism, with its notions of a priori existential truths.  He is particularly hostile to German idealism, which he identifies especially with Hegel and which he attacks in many of his essays (this identification leads him to be remarkably unfair to Kant, an earlier German idealist).  As he makes clear in “The Sentiment of Rationality,” the personality of the would-be knower and various practical concerns are far too relevant to allow for such abstract intellectualism.  The tradition of modern empiricism is more promising, yet too atomistic to allow us to move much beyond the knowledge of acquaintance to genuine comprehension (Will, pp. 63-67, 70, 75-77, 82-86, 89, 92).  Fortunately, James had already learned about the pragmatic approach from Peirce.

a. The Pragmatic Method

James’s book of lectures on Pragmatism is arguably the most influential book of American philosophy.  The first of its eight lectures presents pragmatism as a more attractive middle ground between the two mainstream approaches of European philosophy.  The “tender-minded” approach tends to be rationalistic, intellectualistic, idealistic, optimistic, religious, committed to freedom, monistic, and dogmatic; by contrast, the “tough-minded” approach tends to be empirical, grounded in sensations, materialistic, pessimistic, irreligious, fatalistic, pluralistic, and skeptical.  It is difficult to identify many pure types of either of these in the history of philosophy, and some thinkers (such as Kant) are deliberately mixed, as is James himself.  He thinks that most of us want a philosophical method that is firmly anchored in empirical facts, while being open to, rather than dismissive of, moral and religious values.  He offers pragmatism as a philosophy that coherently meets both demands.  James’s second lecture is committed to showing how the pragmatic method helps us establish meaning by making it a function of practical consequences (the word “pragmatic” means having to do with action and is etymologically related to our English word “practical”).  Before we invest much time or effort in seeking the meaning of anything, we should consider what practical difference it would make if we could find out.  Providing an example to illustrate his point, James refers to the Hegelian notion of God as the all-encompassing Absolute Spirit.  How should we decide whether this is what we should mean by God?  Consider the practical consequences for a believer:  on the one hand, it would provide us with the optimistic, comforting assurance that everything will work out for the best; but, on the other, it also undermines the values of human individuality, freedom, and responsibility.  From that pragmatic perspective, James rejects the Hegelian notion.  Undoubtedly, philosophy provides us with only one legitimate approach to belief, as he observes in his fifth lecture, others being common sense (with its basic concepts derived from experience) and science.  However, these others are impotent in dealing with questions of freedom and value (Pragmatism, pp. 10-13, 18, 26-28, 30-38, 79-80, 83-85).

b. The Pragmatic Theory of Truth

It seems that anything knowable must be true.  But what does it mean to call a proposition or belief “true” from the perspective of pragmatism?  This is the subject of James’s famous sixth lecture.  He begins with a standard dictionary analysis of truth as agreement with reality.  Accepting this, he warns that pragmatists and intellectualists will disagree over how to interpret the concepts of “agreement” and “reality,” the latter thinking that ideas copy what is fixed and independent of us.  By contrast, he advocates a more dynamic and practical interpretation, a true idea or belief being one we can incorporate into our ways of thinking in such a way that it can be experientially validated.  For James, the “reality” with which truths must agree has three dimensions:  (1) matters of fact, (2) relations of ideas (such as the eternal truths of mathematics), and (3) the entire set of other truths to which we are committed.  To say that our truths must “agree” with such realities pragmatically means that they must lead us to useful consequences.  He is a fallibilist, seeing all existential truths as, in theory, revisable given new experience.  They involve a relationship between facts and our ideas or beliefs.  Because the facts, and our experience of them, change we must beware of regarding such truths as absolute, as rationalists tend to do (Pragmatism, pp. 91-97, 100-101).  This relativistic theory generated a firestorm of criticism among mainstream philosophers to which he responded in The Meaning of Truth.

c. The Pragmatic Approach to Belief

Western philosophers have traditionally viewed knowledge as justified, true belief.  So long as the idea of truth is pragmatically analyzed and given a pragmatic interpretation of justification, James seems to accept that view.  His entire philosophy can be seen as fundamentally one of productive beliefs.  All inquiry must terminate in belief or disbelief or doubt; disbelief is merely a negative belief and doubt is the true opposite of both.  Believing in anything involves conceiving of it as somehow real; when we dismiss something as unreal (disbelief), it is typically because it somehow contradicts what we think of as real.  Some of our most fundamental and valuable beliefs do not seem sufficiently justified to be regarded as known.  These “postulates of rationality” include the convictions that every event is caused and that the world as a whole is rationally intelligible (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 283-284, 288-290, 670-672, 675, 677).  As he holds in “The Sentiment of Rationality,” to say that such beliefs, however crucial, are not known, is to admit that, though they involve a willingness to act on them, doubt as to their truth still seems theoretically possible.  He identifies four postulates of rationality as value-related, but unknowable, matters of belief; these are God, immortality, freedom, and moral duty (Will, pp. 90, 95).  He proceeds to deal with each of them individually.

4. Philosophy of Religion

James is arguably the most significant American philosopher of religion in intellectual history, and many of his writings, in addition to the obligatory “Will to Believe” essay and his book on The Varieties of Religious Experience, offer provocative insights into that area.

a. The Will to Believe in God

Because we do not naturally experience the supernatural, James, the radical empiricist, thinks of faith in God as falling short of knowledge.  Yet such faith is pragmatically meaningful to many people, and it is reasonable to wonder whether, how, and to what extent it can be justified.  For James, the logical philosopher trained in science, both logic and science have limits beyond which we can legitimately seek the sentiment of rationality.  His notorious “Will to Believe” essay is designed to be a defense of religious faith in the absence of conclusive logical argumentation or scientific evidence.  It focuses on what he calls a “genuine option,” which is a choice between two hypotheses, which the believer can regard as “living” (personally meaningful), “forced” (mutually exclusive), and “momentous” (involving potentially important consequences).  Whether an option is “genuine” is thus relative to the perspective of a particular believer.  James acknowledges that in our scientific age, there is something dubious about the voluntaristic view that, in some circumstances, we can legitimately choose to believe in the absence of any objective justification.  However, he claims we naturally do so all the time, our moral and political ideas being obvious examples.  When you believe that your mother loves you or in the sincerity of your best friend, you have no conclusively objective evidence.  In addition, you will never be able to secure such evidence.  Yet it often seems unreasonable to refuse to commit to believing such matters; if we did so, the pragmatic consequences would be a more impoverished social life.  Indeed, in some cases, believing and acting on that belief can help increase the chances of the belief being true.  Now let us apply this argument to religious belief.  What does religion in general propose for our belief?  The two-pronged answer is that ultimate reality is most valuable and that we are better off if we believe that.  Committing to that two-pronged belief is meaningful, as is the refusal to do so.  At any given moment, I must either make that two-pronged commitment or not; and how I experience this life, as well as prospects for a possible after-life, may be at stake.  Whether one makes that commitment or not, pragmatic consequences can be involved.  Nor should we imagine that we could avoid having to make a choice, as the commitment not to commit is itself a commitment (Will, pp. 1-4, 7-9, 11-14, 22-30; see also Problems, pp. 221-224).

b. The Varieties of Religious Experience

If religious faith is not to be reduced to arbitrary whimsy (the “will to make believe”), it must rest on some sort of personal experience.  As psychologist and philosopher, James deliberately defines “religion” broadly as the experiences of human individuals insofar as they see themselves related to whatever they regard as divine.  This definition indicates that religion does not require faith in a transcendent, monotheistic God, and that it does not mandate the social dimension of religious community.  James distinguishes between “healthy-mindedness” and the “sick soul” as two extreme types of religious consciousness, the former being characterized by optimistic joy and the latter by a morbid pessimism.  In between these extremes are “the divided self” and the stable, well-integrated believer.  James develops lengthy analyses of religious conversion, saintliness, and mysticism.  In going beyond these, he considers what philosophy might contribute to establishing “over-beliefs” regarding the existence and nature of the divine.  He critically considers traditional arguments for God—the cosmological argument, the argument from design, the moral argument, and the argument from popular consensus—finding none of them particularly cogent, but exhibiting the most respect for the argument from design.  He likewise weighs in the balance and finds wanting arguments for metaphysical and moral divine attributes, finding the latter of more pragmatic relevance to human values, choices, and behavior than the former.  In his final lecture, he draws conclusions regarding three beliefs that experience finds in religions in general:  (1) that our sensible world is part of and derives its significance from a greater spiritual order; (2) that our purpose is fulfilled by achieving harmonious union with it; and (3) that prayer and spiritual communion are efficacious.  Furthermore, religions typically involve two psychological qualities in their believers:  (1) an energetic zest for living; and (2) a sense of security, love, and peace.  Given that thought and feeling both determine conduct, James thinks that different religions are similar in feeling and conduct, their doctrines being more variable, but less essential.  Most generally, these doctrines attempt to diagnose a fundamental uneasiness about our natural state and to prescribe a solution whereby we might be saved (Varieties, pp. 42, 83, 121, 124, 137, 142, 145-147, 330, 334-341, 367, 380-383).

c. James’s Own Religious Views

Although James is somewhat vague regarding his own religious “over-beliefs,” they can be pieced together from various passages.  He believes there is more to reality than our natural world and that this unseen realm generates practical effects in this world.  If we call the supreme being “God,” then we have reason to think the interpersonal relationship between God and humans is dynamic and that God provides us with a guarantee that the moral values we strive to realize will somehow survive us.  James describes himself as a supernaturalist (rather than a materialist) of a sort less refined than idealists and as unable to subscribe to popular Christianity.  He is unwilling to assume that God is one or infinite, even contemplating the polytheistic notion that the divine is a collection of godlike selves (Varieties, pp. 384-386, 388-390, 392-393, 395-396).  In “The Dilemma of Determinism,” James depicts his image of God with a memorable analogy, comparing God to a master chess player engaged in a give-and-take with us novices.  We are free to make our own moves; yet the master knows all the moves we could possibly make, the odds of our choosing one over the others, and how best to respond to any move we choose to make.  This indicates two departures from the traditional Judeo-Christian concept of God, in that the master is interacting with us in time (rather than eternal) and does not know everything in the future, to the extent that it is freely chosen by us.  In “Reflex Action and Theism,” James subscribes to a theistic belief in a personal God with whom we can maintain interpersonal relations, who possesses the deepest power in reality (not necessarily omnipotent) and a mind (not omniscient).  We can love and respect God to the extent that we are committed to the pursuit of common values.  In “Is Life Worth Living?” James even suggests that God may derive strength and energy from our collaboration (Will, pp. 181-182, 116, 122, 141, 61).  Elsewhere, rejecting the Hegelian notion of God as an all-encompassing Absolute, he subscribes to a God that is finite in knowledge or in power or in both, one that acts in time and has a history and an environment, like us (Universe, pp. 269, 272; see Letters, vol. 2, pp. 213-215, for James’s responses to a 1904 questionnaire regarding his personal religious beliefs).

5. Metaphysics

a. Realms of Reality

In contrast to monists such as Hegel, James believes in multiple worlds, specifying seven realms of reality we can experience:  (1) the realm that serves as the touchstone of reality for most of us is the world of physical objects of sense experience; (2) the world of science, things understood in terms of physical forces and laws of nature, is available to the educated; (3) philosophy and mathematics expose us to a world of abstract truth and ideal relations; (4) as humans, we are all subject to the distortions of commonplace illusion and prejudices; (5) our cultures expose us to the realms of mythology and fiction; (6) each of us has his or her own subjective opinions, which may or may not be expressed to others; and (7) the world of madness can disconnect us from the reality in which others can readily believe.  Normally we can inhabit more than one of these and be able to discriminate among them.  What we take to be real must connect with us personally because we find it interesting and/or important, which emphasizes elements of both subjectivity and pragmatic relevance (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 292-299).

b. The Philosophical Importance of Metaphysics

Part of what makes James a great philosopher in the grand tradition is that, unlike so many post-Hegelian Western philosophers, he advocates the pivotal importance of metaphysics.  The theory of reality in general provides a crucial foundational context for philosophy of human nature, philosophy of religion, ethics, social philosophy, and so forth.  Philosophy essentially is an intellectual attempt to come to grips with reality, as he says on the first page of Pragmatism.  In its third lecture, James approaches four standard metaphysical issues using his pragmatic method, those of (1) physical and spiritual substance, (2) materialism vs. theism as explanations of our world, (3) whether the natural world indicates intelligent design, and (4) freedom vs. universal determinism.  For each of these, we cannot conclusively establish where we should stand based merely on what experience discloses about the past, but can take reasonable positions based on pragmatic anticipated future consequences.  As modern philosophy demonstrates, we can never directly and immediately experience any sort of substance; however, we do experience physical qualities and mental events and can best make sense of them by attributing them to bodies and minds.  The world is what it is, regardless of whether it is the result of divine activity or of the random interactions of atoms moving in space; whether or not it was intelligently designed in the distant past has no bearing on the fact that we experience it as we do.  But a world intelligently designed by a deity pragmatically involves the possibility of a promising future, whereas one resulting from unconscious physical forces promises nothing more than a collapse into meaningless obliteration.  On the one hand, if everything we may do or fail to do is determined, why bother doing anything?  On the other hand, if we are free to choose at least some of our actions, then effort can be meaningful.  In the fourth lecture, James states that our world can be viewed as one (monism) or as an irreducible many (pluralism).  There are certain ways in which we humans generate a unity of the objects of our experience, yet the absolute unity to which monism is committed remains a perpetually vanishing ideal.  In his seventh lecture, James identifies three dimensions of reality:  (1) the objects of factual experience; (2) relationships between our sensations and our ideas and among our ideas; and (3) the entire network of truths to which we are committed at any given time.  Again, we see here a combination of subjectivity and pragmatic relevance that views reality as a process of development, which he calls “humanism” (Pragmatism, pp. 7, 43-55, 62-69, 71, 73-74, 110-111, 115-116; see also Truth, pp. 100-101).

c. Monism vs. Pluralism

James intended Some Problems of Philosophy to be largely a textbook in metaphysics, which he defines in terms of the ultimate principles of reality, both within and beyond our human experience.  Much of it concerns the issue of the one and the many, which is arguably the oldest problem of Western philosophy and represents the split between collective monism (such as Hegel’s) and distributive pluralism (such as James himself advocates).  Monism, pursued to its logical extreme, is deterministic, setting up a sharp dichotomy between what is necessary and what is impossible, while pluralism allows for possibilities that may, but need not, be realized.  The former must be either optimistic or pessimistic in its outlook, depending on whether the future that is determined is seen as attractive or unattractive.  In contrast, pluralism’s possibilities allow for a “melioristic” view of the future as possibly better, depending on choices we freely make.  Pluralism need not specify how much unnecessary possibility there is in the world; by contrast, monism must say that everything about the future is locked in from all eternity—to which pluralism says, “Ever not quite.”  James is advocating what he calls the possibility of “novelty” in the world.  Pluralism, being melioristic, calls for our trusting in and cooperating with one another in order to realize desirable possibilities that are not assured (Problems, pp. 31, 114, 139-143, 205, 228-230).  In his Essays in Radical Empiricism, James attempts to distance himself from the philosophical dualism that sees physical reality (bodies) and spiritual reality (minds) as essentially distinct.  He claims that the “philosophy of pure experience” is more consonant with the theory of novelty, indeterminism, moralism, and humanism that he advocates, though it is less than clear why.  We never experience mind in separation from body, and he dismisses as an illusion the notion of consciousness as substantial; however, he does not want to reject the reality of mind as a materialist might do.  So after years of opposing monism, he adopts an admittedly vague sort of neutral (neither materialistic nor idealistic) monism that sees thoughts and things as fundamentally the same stuff, the further definition of which eludes us (Empiricism, pp. 48, 115-117, 120).

6. Freedom and Morality

In the eighth lecture of Pragmatism, James sees monism as tending to a passive sort of quietism rather than to a vital life of active effort.  By contrast, pluralistic pragmatism emphasizes the possibilities that may be if we work to realize them.  Monism determines the future optimistically as working out for the best, whatever we do, or pessimistically as working out for the worst, whatever we do.  By contrast, pluralistic meliorism holds that it can get better if we freely try to make it so.  Whether we embrace the option of freedom and moral responsibility or not is ultimately a matter of personal faith rather than one of objective logic or scientific evidence (Pragmatism, pp. 125, 127-128, 132).

a. Human Freedom

Like God and human immortality, the possibility of which James defends without firmly committing himself to believing in it (Immortality, pp. 3, 6-7, 10-18, 20, 23-24, 28-31, 35-37, 39-41, 43-45), freedom is a postulate of rationality, an unprovable article of faith.  James wrote an essay on the topic, called “The Dilemma of Determinism.”  After admitting that human freedom is an old and shopworn topic about which we may suspect that nothing new can be said, and that he will not pretend to be able to prove or disprove, he launches a pragmatic justification for believing in it.  Indeterminism, the belief in freedom, holds that there is some degree of possibility that is not necessitated by the rest of reality, while determinism must deny all such possibilities.  These beliefs constitute exhaustive and mutually exclusive alternatives, so that if we reject either, we logically should accept the other.  Let us consider a commonplace example such as walking home from campus.  Before the fact neither the determinist nor the indeterminist can infallibly predict which path will be taken, but after the fact the determinist can irrefutably claim that the path taken was necessary, while the indeterminist can irrefutably claim that it was freely chosen.  Thus far, there is no advantage on either side.  But now consider the example of a man gruesomely murdering his loving wife.  We hear the awful details recounted and naturally regret what the wicked man did to her.  Now, what are we to make of that regret from the perspective of determinism?  What sense can it make to regret what had to occur?  From that perspective, we logically must embrace pessimism (all of reality is determined to be bad) or optimism (everything is destined to work out for the best) or subjectivism (good and evil are merely subjective interpretations we artificially cast on things).  All of these can be logically coherent positions, but each of them minimizes the evil we experience in the world and trivializes our natural reaction of regret as pointless.  From a practical (as opposed to a logical) point of view, can we live with that?  James deliberately puts the point quite personally.  Though thoughtful and reflective pessimists, optimists, and subjectivists can live with it, he would not, because its pragmatic implications would render life not worth living.  In that sense, determinism, though logically tenable, is pragmatically unacceptable, and James commits to indeterminism (Will, pp. 145-146, 150-152, 155-156, 160-161, 175-176, 178-179).

b. Moral Responsibility

In addition to God, immortality, and freedom, moral duty is a fourth postulate of rationality.  James offers us one remarkable essay on the topic, entitled “The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life.”  He addresses three questions:  (1) the psychological one, regarding the origins of our moral values and judgments, (2) the metaphysical one, regarding the grounds of meaning for our basic moral concepts, and (3) the casuistic one, regarding how we should order conflicting values.  First, our human nature comprises a capacity for an intuitive moral sense, but this must be developed in a context of values that socially evolve.  Second, our basic moral concepts of good and bad, right and wrong, and so forth, are all person-relative, grounded in the claims people make on their environment.  Third, when values conflict, those which would seem to satisfy as many personal demands as possible, while frustrating the fewest, should have priority regardless of the nature of those demands.  This represents a pragmatic form of moral relativism, in which no action can be absolutely good or evil in all conceivable circumstances.  Finally, James distinguishes between “the easy-going mood” that tries to avoid conflict, and “the strenuous mood” that strives to achieve ideals, apparently preferring the latter (Will, pp. 185-186, 190, 194-195, 197, 201, 205, 209, 211).

c. The Meaningfulness of Life

In answering the question of what is the primary objective of human life, James maintains that a natural answer is happiness.  It is this, which motivates us to act and endure.  Evolution is often seen as a progressive advance towards happiness (Varieties, pp. 76, 85).  The person who seems incapable of achieving it may well wonder whether life is worth living; suicide deciding that it is not.  For James there is no absolute answer, and it is relative to the life being lived.  A human life involves an ongoing series of possibilities.  Some of these “maybes” may be realized if we believe in our own capacity to realize them; others will not be, either because we do not try or because we try and fail.  Life can become worth living if we believe that it is and act on that belief, our commitment giving it meaning (Will, pp. 37, 59-62).  Our happiness seems to require that we have ideals, that we strive to achieve them, and that we think we are making some progress towards doing so (Talks, pp. 185-189).

7. Social Philosophy

a. Individuals and Their Communities

James’s philosophy is so individualistic that it does not allow for a robust theory of community.  Still, he offers us some interesting insights and one great paper.  “Great Men and Their Environment” views one’s society as not only a context in which great individuals emerge, but even as playing a selective role in allowing their greatness to develop. In turn, that social environment is affected by them.  Whether or not an individual will be able to have an impact is, to some extent, determined by society.  Thus socially significant individuals and their communities have a dynamic, correlative relationship.  In a follow-up article, “The Importance of Individuals,” he maintains that agents of social change, beyond being gifted in some way(s), tend to take greater advantage of given circumstances than more ordinary persons do (Will, pp. 225-226, 229-230, 232, 259).

b. War and Peace

In the last decade of his life, following the Spanish-American War, in which Theodore Roosevelt, his former student, was the hero, James gave a talk at the banquet of the Universal Peace Congress.  Regarding human nature as essentially antagonistic, he warns against our permanent tendencies to mass violence and the romantic idealization of war.  We have to forever be on our guard to resist those dangerous, destructive tendencies; however, he doubts that humanity will ever be able to achieve universal disarmament and peace.  What we can and should do is work to minimize conflicts and to resolve them non-violently.  The great paper James wrote in the area of social relations, written just a few years before the outbreak of World War I and first published the month he died, is “The Moral Equivalent of War.”  In it he warns of the extreme challenge of suppressing our martial tendencies.  Warfare has become so costly, in terms of treasure and carnage, thanks to modern technology, that we need to find some way of rechanneling the primitive tendencies inherited from our ancestors.  How can we create an atmosphere in which peace is the norm rather than that interim period between wars?  Identifying himself as a “pacifist,” he nevertheless admits that there are desirable human qualities—such as patriotism, loyalty, social solidarity, and national vigor—that have traditionally been nurtured by war and the preparation for conducting it.  The question at hand is whether a “moral equivalent” might be found that would generate such martial virtues without involving the horrible destructiveness of war. Since wars are the results of human choices rather than fatalistically determined, he anticipates a time when they will be formally outlawed among civilized societies.  But then how can these martial virtues still be nurtured?  His answer is that we should draft young adults into national service, as opposed to military service, fighting against adverse natural conditions rather than against fellow human beings, working for a time in coal mines, on constructing roads, and so forth.  Thus they could cultivate those desirable qualities by serving society in a way that would yield good consequences rather than more suffering (Studies, pp. 300-301, 303-306, 267, 269, 275-276, 280, 283, 286-292).

c. Democratic Tolerance and Social Progress

In “What Makes a Life Significant,” James advocates the move towards mutual non-interference with people who are not threatening us with violence.  Tolerance of others is an antidote to cruelty and injustice.  He maintains that the trend of social evolution is in the direction of democratic progress.  Yet this trend requires effort, and its continuation poses challenges for us, including that of striving for a more equitable distribution of wealth (Talks, pp. 170, 178, 189).  His commitments to individual freedom, mutual respect, peaceful interrelationships, and tolerance converge to point us in the direction of progressing towards what he calls “the intellectual republic” (Will, p. 30).  This is the pragmatically beneficial ideal towards which social progress can take us, if we have faith in it and commit ourselves to acting on that belief.

8. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • William James, Essays in Radical Empiricism and A Pluralistic Universe (called “Empiricism” and “Universe,” respectively).  New York:  E. P. Dutton, 1971.
  • William James, The Letters of William James, Two Volumes in One, ed. Henry James (called “Letters”).  Boston:  Little, Brown, 1926.
  • William James, The Meaning of Truth (called “Truth”).  Ann Arbor:  University of Michigan Press, 1970.
  • William James, Memories and Studies (called “Studies”).  Westport:  Greenwood Press, 1968)
  • William James, Pragmatism (called “Pragmatism”), ed. Bruce Kuklick.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1981.
  • William James, The Principles of Psychology, Two Volumes (called “Principles”).  New York:  Dover, 1950.
  • William James, Psychology:  Briefer Course (called “Psychology”).  New York:  Henry Holt, 1910.
  • William James, Some Problems of Philosophy, ed. Henry James (called “Problems”).  New York:  Longmans, Green, 1931.
  • William James, Talks to Teachers on Psychology:  and to Students on some of Life’s Ideals (called “Talks”).  New York:  W. W. Norton, 1958.
  • William James, The Varieties of Religious Experience (called “Varieties”).  New York:  New American Library, 1958.
  • William James, The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy and Human Immortality (called “Will” and ”Immortality,” respectively).  New York:  Dover, 1956.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Jacques Barzun, A Stroll with William James.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1984.
    • This is a non-technical discussion of James’s life and thought.
  • Patrick Kiaran Dooley, Pragmatism as Humanism:  The Philosophy of William James.  Totowa:  Littlefield, Adams, 1975.
    • This is a brief but good introduction to James’s philosophy of human nature.
  • Richard M. Gale, The Philosophy of William James:  An Introduction.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • This is a monograph on the theory and vision of James.
  • R. W. B. Lewis, The Jameses:  A Family Narrative.  New York:  Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 1991.
    • This is a monumental collective biography of the James family.
  • Gerald E. Myers, William James:  His Life and Thought.  New Haven:  Yale University Press, 1986.
    • This is a long, comprehensive, in-depth analysis of James’s psychology and philosophy.
  • Ralph Barton Perry, The Thought and Character of William James:  Briefer Version.  Cambridge:  Harvard University Press, 1948.
    • This is a classic intellectual biography of James by one of his famous students.
  • Ruth Anna Putnam, The Cambridge Companion to William James.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1997.
    • This is a collection of critical analyses of important parts of James’s thought.
  • Robert D. Richardson, William James:  In the Maelstrom of American Modernism.  Boston:  Houghton Mifflin, 2006.
    • This intellectual biography of James studies the man through his work.
  • Robert J. Vanden Burgt, The Religious Philosophy of William James.  Chicago:  Nelson-Hall, 1981.
    • This is a short but illuminating treatment of James’s philosophy of religion.

Author Information

Wayne P. Pomerleau
Email: Pomerleau@calvin.gonzaga.edu
Gonzaga University
U. S. A.

Charles Sanders Peirce (1839—1914)

peirceC.S. Peirce was a scientist and philosopher best known as the earliest proponent of pragmatism. An influential and polymathic thinker, Peirce is among the greatest of American minds. His thought was a seminal influence on William James, his life long friend, and John Dewey, his one time student. James and Dewey went on to popularize pragmatism thereby achieving what Peirce’s inability to gain lasting academic employment prevented him from doing. A life long practitioner of science, Peirce applied scientific principles to philosophy but his understanding and admiration of Kant also colored his work. Peirce was analytic and scientific, devoted to logical and scientific rigor, and an architectonic philosopher in the mold of Kant or Aristotle. His best-known theories, pragmatism and the account of inquiry, are both scientific and experimental but form part of a broad architectonic scheme. Long considered an eccentric figure whose contribution to pragmatism was to provide its name and whose importance was as an influence upon James and Dewey, Peirce’s significance in his own right is now largely accepted.

Table of Contents

  1. Peirce’s Life
  2. Peirce’s Works and Influence
  3. The Interpretation of Peirce’s Philosophy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Peirce’s Life

Charles Sanders Peirce was born September 10th, 1839, in Cambridge, MA to Benjamin Peirce, the brilliant Harvard mathematician and astronomer, and Sarah Hunt Mills, the daughter of Senator Elijah Hunt Mills. Peirce led a privileged early life; parental indulgences meant his father refused to discipline his children for fear of suppressing their individuality. Further, the academic and intellectual climate of the family home meant intellectual dignitaries were frequent visitors to the Peirce household. These visitors included mathematicians and men of science, poets, lawyers and politicians. This environment saw young Charles Peirce’s precocious intellect readily indulged.

Peirce was the second of five children and four talented brothers, one of whom, James Mills Peirce (his elder brother), followed their father to a mathematics professorship at Harvard. Another brother, Herbert Henry Davis Peirce, carved out a distinguished career in the Foreign Service whilst Peirce’s youngest brother, Benjamin Mills Peirce, showed promise as an engineer but died young. The talent of the Peirce brothers, and particularly Charles, stems in large part from the colossal intellect and influence of their father.

Benjamin Peirce was instrumental in the development of American Sciences in the 19th Century through his own intellectual achievements and by lobbying Washington for funds. He was influential in the creation of Harvard’s Lawrence Scientific School and in the foundation of a National Academy of the Sciences. A further role, which was to prove important in Charles Peirce’s life, was Peirce Senior’s influential position in the U.S Coastal and Geodetic Survey from 1852 until his death in 1880. Benjamin Peirce provided a mighty role model, guiding the prodigious development of the young Peirce’s intellect through heuristic teaching. This gave Peirce a love of science and commitment to rigorous inquiry from a young age.

The influence of Benjamin Peirce on Charles’ intellect and, through refusing discipline, his fierce independence of spirit, is immense. The devotion to mathematical thoroughness and love of science colored Peirce’s endeavors for the rest of his life. Further, Peirce’s free spirited independence of mind undoubtedly contributed to the stubbornness and arrogance that surfaced in moments of adversity to compound the professional difficulties that he continually faced.

Despite some problems in school due to Peirce’s unsettled behavior, he graduated from Harvard in 1859. Peirce remained consistently in the lower quarter of his class but his indifference to the work and disdain at the intellectual requirements asked of him seem to be the cause of his poor performance. He remained at Harvard as a resident for a further year receiving a Master of Arts degree. Further, in 1863, he graduated from Harvard’s Lawrence Scientific School with the first Bachelor of Science degree awarded Summa cum Laude.

By 1863, with his education complete and having secured employment with the U.S Coastal Survey, Peirce’s marriage to Harriet Melusina Fay, a feminist campaigner of good Cambridge patrician stock, appeared to lay the foundation for a fruitful career and stable life. Peirce’s star began to burn brightly and in 1865 he delivered a lecture series at Harvard and gave the Lowell Institute Lectures a year later at age twenty-six. He published early well-received responses to Kant’s system of categories in 1867 and to Descartes account of knowledge, science and doubt in 1868.

His research in geodesy and gravimetrics at the U.S. Coastal Survey gained him international respect and, through European research tours, enabled him to make contact with British and European logicians. During an early research tour of Europe, Peirce’s work on Boolean logic and relatives gained him respect and attention from the British Logicians W.S. Jevons and Augustus De Morgan. In 1867, The Academy of Arts and Science elected Peirce as a member and The National Academy of Sciences followed suit in 1877. Peirce also began extra work at the Harvard Observatory in 1869 and published a book from his research there, the 1878 Photometric Researches.

Other work in Philosophy saw Peirce begin the now legendary Metaphysical Club in 1872 with, amongst others, William James. He also published his best-known body of work, The Popular Science Monthly series, in 1877 and 1878. This included “The Fixation of Belief” and “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” a continuation of his earlier anti-Cartesian thoughts and the first developed statements of his theories of inquiry and pragmatism. By 1879, Peirce obtained an academic appointment at Johns Hopkins University, teaching logic for the philosophy department. Here he continued to make strides in logic, developing a theory of relatives and quantifiers (independently of Frege). He published this work with his student O.H. Mitchell in the 1883 Studies in Logic. This volume contained a range of collaborative papers from Peirce and his JHU students.

All looked well for Peirce by the early 1880’s, and with the promise of tenure at Johns Hopkins he felt he could commit himself to a life pursuing his greatest love, logic. However, the beginnings of Peirce’s downfall were already stirring during this early successful period. Peirce’s work for the U.S. Coastal Survey and Harvard Observatory had led to tensions with the President of the Harvard Corporation, C.W. Elliot, about pay. Also, Peirce’s rise through the ranks of the Coastal Survey was partly nepotistic and at the expense of other men who expected to take the positions he gained. Further, the death of Benjamin Peirce in 1880 left Peirce without his most powerful backer in the Coastal Survey.

This need not have mattered had the Johns Hopkins appointment gone smoothly but earlier occurrences had also damaged this opportunity. Peirce had separated from his wife in 1876 and openly liased with a French mistress. Peirce’s wife had long suspected him of extra-marital affairs, even with the wives of his Coastal Survey colleagues, but the public nature of this particular liaison proved too much for her and she left him. Peirce lived openly with his mistress during the period from separation in 1876 to divorce in 1883 when he and his mistress married, seven days after the decree fini.

The affair itself need not have caused excessive moral consternation, but the indecorous manner in which it was conducted resulted in outrage: both the patrician families of Cambridge, and academic establishment of Harvard and Johns Hopkins were appalled. The President of JHU, Daniel Coit Gilman, withdrew renewal of all contracts in Philosophy, and later reinstated all positions but that of Peirce, thereby “resigning” Peirce from his post. Peirce had lost the only academic position he was ever to hold. His problems continued to mount.

The Coastal Survey, now his only means of income, was subject to government audit after accusations of wide spread financial impropriety. Although subsequent reports exonerated Peirce, the new climate led him into difficulties with work, and his inclination to complete it. By 1891 Peirce had left his only secure means of income at the Coastal Survey and, living on a Pennsylvanian farm purchased from inheritance in 1888, he retreated to a life of hardship and academic isolation with his now frail and consumptive second wife, Juliette.

Despite repeated efforts by friends to find him work, Peirce’s poor reputation consistently saw him rejected. Such was Peirce’s low standing that a lecture series organized by William James and Josiah Royce in 1898 (initially in the hope that it might open a door to a position at Harvard) took place in a private home in Cambridge. It seems that fear of Peirce’s potential to corrupt the morals of the young led the Harvard Corporation to refuse permission for Peirce to lecture on campus. Later lectures at Harvard in 1903 did take place on campus after the Corporation had softened its stance, but the academic establishment, particularly at Harvard, never came to accept or forgive Peirce.

Lecture series, such as those organized by James and Royce, along with hack writing for dictionaries and popular magazines, were Peirce’s main philosophical outlet and primary source of income. Attempts to secure money from the Carnegie Institution to fund a full statement of his philosophical system in 1902 failed and between the 1890’s and his death from cancer in April 1914, Peirce lived in a state of penury struggling to find an outlet for his work. Some important publications appeared in The Monist during the 1890’s and again in1907 following a brief renewal of interest in his work. This was due in large part to James’ acknowledgment of his role in founding pragmatism. However, Peirce’s published work petered out into a series of rejections and incomplete projects and although he did not stop writing until his death, he failed to publish a mature account of his philosophy whilst alive. Peirce died lost and unappreciated by all but a few of his American contemporaries.

2. Peirce’s Works and Influence

During his lifetime, Peirce’s philosophy influenced, and took influence from, the work of William James. The two men where close friends and exchanged ideas for most of their adult lives. However, despite similarities and mutual influence, they strove hard to distinguish their own brand of pragmatism from each other’s. This is particularly so after James’ California Union Address where he attributed the discovery of the doctrine to Peirce and identified the early papers, “The Fixation of Belief” and “How to Make our Ideas Clear,” as the source of pragmatism. Peirce thought James too “nominalistic” in his pragmatism and too wary of logic; James thought Peirce too dense and obscure in his formulations. Nevertheless, the connections between the two founding fathers of pragmatism are clear.

Also well-acknowledged is the influence of Peirce upon John Dewey and a generation of young Johns Hopkins logic students and colleagues including: Oscar Mitchell, Fabien Franklin and Christine Ladd-Franklin. Peirce’s work at JHU had a profound effect upon his students and, although John Dewey initially found Peirce’s logic classes obscure and not like logic as he understood it, he later came to realize the importance of Peirce’s approach. Peirce’s own response to Dewey’s pragmatism was much the same as his response to James’: too “nominalistic.” Dewey, however, fully acknowledged the influence and importance of Peirce, even hailing his work as more pragmatic in spirit than that of William James.

Within the field of logic, Peirce’s greatest passion, he also exercised some influence in his own lifetime. Peirce’s development of Boolean algebra influenced the logician and mathematician Ernst Schröder, with whom Peirce exchanged correspondence and mutual admiration. The outcome of this influence is an interesting and often unacknowledged effect upon the development of modern logic: it is Peirce’s account of quantification and logical syntax that leads to twentieth century logic, not Frege’s. Of course, Frege’s work is important and predates much of Peirce’s development by five years or so, but at the time, it was all but ignored. It is from Peirce that we can trace a direct line of influence and development, through Schröder to Peano, and finally to Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica.

Beyond his work in the development of pragmatism and modern logic, Peirce identified his own ideas with that of James’ Harvard colleague, Josiah Royce. Peirce felt that of all his contemporaries, Royce’s work most closely reflected his own, and indeed, Peirce’s semiotics and metaphysics greatly influenced Royce. Royce’s respect for Peirce’s work continued with the relish that Royce displayed at the chance to edit the eighty thousand or so pages of unpublished manuscripts sold to Harvard in 1914 by Juliette Peirce, after Charles’ death. Unfortunately, Royce died in 1916, too soon to accomplish anything with the disorganized manuscripts. However, by bringing the papers to Harvard, Royce effectively secured the long-term influence of Peirce beyond his own lifetime.

The editorial task of organizing the Peirce papers did not continue smoothly after Royce’s death, but eventually passed to a young C.I. Lewis, who had already shown some appreciation of Peirce’s work in the development of logic in his 1918 publication A Survey of Symbolic Logic. Although Lewis quickly found the task of editing Peirce’s manuscripts not to his taste, his contact with them allowed him to develop answers to his own philosophical problems and much of Peirce’s systematicity is reflected in Lewis’ work. Instead, the Peirce papers that inspired both Royce and Lewis came to fruition under the joint editorship of Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss. Their editorial work culminated in six volumes of The Collected Papers of C.S. Peirce between 1931 and 1935, and for fifty years this was the most important primary source in Peirce scholarship. Hartshorne and Weiss remained interested in Peirce’s work throughout their working lives. Further, both men supervised the young Richard Rorty, which may account for some of his early favorable accounts of Peirce. Of course, Rorty later rejected the value and status of Peirce as a pragmatist.

In the late 1950’s, The Collected Papers, begun by Hartshorne and Weiss, were completed with two volumes, edited by Arthur Burks. Burks had, prior to his editorship of The Collected Papers, worked on some Peirce inspired accounts of names and indexical reference. Burks’ readings of Peirce on names and indices have recently inspired the Referential/Reflexive account of names and indexical expressions by the Stanford philosopher, John Perry.

Other than The Collected Papers and the influence that it has had, Peirce was published posthumously in 1923 in a volume called Chance, Love and Logic, edited by Morris Cohen who worked on the Harvard manuscripts to create this small volume. Along with an appendix in Ogden and Richards’ 1923, The Meaning of Meaning, based mainly on Peirce’s correspondence with his English friend, Victoria Lady Welby, Peirce exercised his most interesting and most contentious influence.

The young Cambridge philosopher and mathematician, F.P. Ramsey, knew of these early volumes, and was greatly interested by them. Ramsey clearly acknowledges the influence of Peirce in his 1926 article, “Truth and Probability,” where he claims to base certain parts of his paper upon Peirce’s work. Ramsey’s interest in Peirce is not contentious. The influence of Ramsey upon the later Wittgenstein is also widely acknowledged. However, the subject of some speculation is the influence of Peirce upon Wittgenstein, via Ramsey. There is no direct acknowledgment of Peirce by Wittgenstein, but Ramsey’s review of the Tractatus recommends Peirce’s type/token distinction to Wittgenstein, a recommendation that Wittgenstein accepted. Wittgenstein did not hide the effect of Ramsey’s advice on his later work, and although the exact nature of the advice is unknown, it is common knowledge that Ramsey thought the Tractatus could overcome its problems by moving towards pragmatism. Potentially then, Peirce can claim an indirect influence over the later Wittgenstein.

The effect of Peirce’s work, through The Collected Papers and early posthumous publications, is not merely of historical interest though. His work is in many ways still alive in contemporary debate. Within pragmatism, the work of both Susan Haack and Christopher Hookway has a distinctly Peircian flavor. Susan Haack in particular has vigorously defended Peirce’s claim to pragmatism against the anti-Peircian strain of Rorty’s new pragmatism. A further influence in contemporary debate has been the presence of Peircian views in the Philosophy of Science. Peirce’s views on science combine distinctly Popperian and Kuhnian views and Popper even names Peirce as one of the greatest of philosophers. Also within the philosophy of science, Peirce’s theories of induction and probability have influenced the work of R.B. Braithewaite. Further, Peirce’s theory of the economics of research is now coming to be understood as a potential response to problems like Hempel’s Paradox of the Ravens and Goodman’s New Puzzle of Induction.

In other areas, some modern epistemologists have embraced virtue epistemology, an attempt to conduct the theory of knowledge by defining the qualities of the knower or true believer rather than knowledge or true belief directly. Two of the leading players in this approach to epistemology, Christopher Hookway and Linda Zagzebski, both acknowledge the thought of Peirce upon their work, and as a precursor to their discipline. Also, Jaakko Hintikka and Risto Hilpinen et al. point out the debt that their long running project, to define semantic concepts like quantifiers and propositions in terms of zero-sum games, owes to Peirce’s work.

Apart from these strictly analytic influences, Peirce also exercises some influence in European philosophy. Particularly noteworthy is the influence of Peirce upon the Neo-Kantian philosophies of Karl-Otto Apel and Helmut Pape, which emphasize a more Kantian reading of Peirce’s philosophy. Perhaps most important, though, is Peirce’s influence upon Jürgen Habermas. Habermas uses and refines crucial elements of Peirce’s account of inquiry in his own political and social philosophy. Particularly central is Peirce’s notion of a community of inquirers. For Peirce, the community of inquirers is a trans-historical notion, acting as a regulative ideal for the growth of knowledge through science. Habermas adapts the Peircian notion of community in two ways. First, the regulative ideal becomes a more concrete notion ranging across actual communities and political and social dialogue occurring within them. Second, the scientific and epistemological purpose of the intersubjective community becomes a social and political purpose on Habermas’ view. Clearly, Habermas uses Peirce’s ideas in ways that move away from simple Peircian concerns. Nonetheless, Peirce’s ideas are of importance to him.

Besides these influences, the potential for further and continued involvement of Peirce’s thought in philosophical debate has grown considerably over the last few years as the tools of Peirce scholarship have entered a new period. The Collected Papers edited by Hartshorne, Weiss and Burks, have been an invaluable source for anyone interested in Peirce, but the editorial policy employed there is idiosyncratic in the way it gathers Peirce’s work together. The Collected Papers takes Peirce’s manuscripts from across a fifty-year period and edits them topically. Often, Peirce’s views from early and late work are presented together as though they are a single connected thought on some topic. This has the effect of making Peirce’s thought seem disjointed and often self-contradictory within the space of two or three passages. However, new tools are now emerging and since the early 1980’s, the reorganization of Peirce’s manuscripts in chronological order by the Peirce Edition Project has given rise to eight volumes of a projected thirty. This reorganized edition, published as The Writings of C.S. Peirce, has already led to an increased understanding of the subtle development of Peirce’s ideas. The hope is that as The Writings of C.S. Peirce continues to grow, our understanding will grow also and with this greater understanding will come increased involvement of Peirce’s ideas in contemporary debate.

3. The Interpretation of Peirce’s Philosophy

Peirce’s approach to philosophy is that of an established scientist; he treated philosophy as an interactive and experimental discipline. This scientific approach to Philosophy, which Peirce labeled “laboratory philosophy,” reflects important themes throughout his work. Pragmatism, for instance, takes the meaning of a concept to depend upon its practical bearings. The upshot of this maxim is that a concept is meaningless if it has no practical or experiential effect on the way we conduct our lives or inquiries. Similarly, within Peirce’s theory of inquiry, the scientific method is the only means through which to fix belief, eradicate doubt and progress towards a final steady state of knowledge.

Clearly then, Peirce is a scientifically minded philosopher, and on some readings appears to trump the Vienna positivists to a verificationist principle of meaning and scientific vision of philosophy. In other respects, though, Peirce often focuses on topics outside the remit of scientific and naturalistic philosophy. For instance, Peirce wrote extensively on issues in metaphysics where he defined universal categories of experience or phenomena, after Kant. He also constructed vast systems of signs and semiotics. Of course, all of these endeavors are colored, in some respects, by his distinctly scientific turn of mind. However, the point is that Peirce’s philosophical writings cover more than half a century and a wide range of topics.

The breadth of Peirce’s philosophical interests has lead to some difficulty in interpreting his work as a whole. How, for instance, do his metaphysical writings relate to his work on truth and inquiry? Thomas Goudge (1950) argues that Peirce’s works consist of two conflicting strands, one naturalistic and hard headedly scientific, the other metaphysical and transcendental. Others take Peirce’s work, both naturalistic and transcendental, to be part of an interrelated system. Murray Murphey (1961) argues that Peirce never quite succeeded in integrating his various philosophical themes into a unified whole and identifies four separate attempts. However, the view that a single architectonic system exists has since replaced this view. Important work by Christopher Hookway (1985), Douglas Anderson (1995) and Nathan Houser (1992) shows how fruitful this treatment of Peirce is and now constitutes the orthodox position in interpreting his work. Their view treats Peirce’s philosophy as a panoramic connected vision, containing themes, issues and areas that Peirce worked upon and moved between at various points in his life. However, treating Peirce’s work as a connected whole can prove awkward when encountering this material for the first time.

Peirce is a difficult philosopher to understand at times, his work is full of cumbersome terminology and often assumes knowledge of his other work. Often, trying to understand Peirce’s theories on individual topics is an involved task in itself; attempting to understand how it fits into a broader, interrelated, system can seem like an unwelcome complication. One approach, then, is to tackle Peirce’s work topic by topic without too much emphasis upon the interconnectedness of this work. The most common topics are Peirce’s account of truth and inquiry or his pragmatism. If the systematic nature of Peirce’s philosophy is approached at all, it is after some familiarity with individual topics has been attained. This approach is not without its merits since it makes Peirce more immediately digestible. However, it can have the effect of leaving certain important elements in Peirce’s work unappreciated. For instance, why is there an all-pervasive penchant for triads, or “threes,” in Peirce’s work? This is a common Peircian theme and is best appreciated by understanding the systematic vision that Peirce has for his philosophy.

The difficulty, then, is finding a balance between the completeness of the architectonic approach to Peirce’s work, and its related complexity. The strategy employed here is to introduce Peirce’s work through a series of entries which detail both his broader philosophical system and individual topics within it. The hope is that the reader can approach Peirce’s work topic by topic through reading the relatively self-contained entries on individual elements of his philosophy. However, the provision of an introductory entry giving an overview of Peirce’s philosophical system enables the reader to see how these individual topics hang together within his broader vision.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first wide spread presentation of Peirce’s work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982-. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce’s views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor).
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2), (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce’s writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries, particularly by Nathan Houser in Volume 1.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, D. 1995. The Strands of System. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press).
    • A systematic reading of Peirce’s thought which, in its introduction, makes an in-depth breakdown of the elements of the system and their relation to each other. Its main body reproduces two important papers by Peirce with accompanying commentary.
  • Brent, J. 1993. Charles Sanders Peirce: A Life. (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The definitive biography of Peirce, it takes a warts-and-all approach to Peirce’s character and life, and attempts to show the relationship between the events of his life, and his philosophical development.
  • Goudge, T. 1950. The Thought of C.S. Peirce. (Toronto: University of Toronto Press).
    • Early and important view of Peirce’s philosophy which emphasizes an unbridgeable schism between the scientific and metaphysical strands of Peirce’s work. Long superseded but still a good secondary source.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1985. Peirce. (London: Routledge and Kegan Paul).
    • Important treatment of Peirce as a systematic philosopher but with emphasis on Peirce’s Kantian inheritance and later rejection of the transcendental approach to truth, logic and inquiry.
  • Murphey, M. 1961. The Development of Peirce’s Philosophy. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
    • Early work that identifies four periods and separate systems in Peirce’s work. Again, superseded by the single system interpretation of Anderson, Hookway and Houser et al.

Author Information

Albert Atkin
Email: pip99aka@sheffield.ac.uk
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom

William Edward Burghardt Du Bois (1868—1963)

duboisW. E. B. Du Bois was an important American thinker: a poet, philosopher, economic historian, sociologist, and social critic. His work resists easy classification. This article focuses exclusively on Du Bois' contribution to philosophy; but the reader must keep in mind throughout that Du Bois is more than a philosopher; he is, for many, a great social leader. His extensive efforts all bend toward a common goal, the equality of colored people. His philosophy is significant today because it addresses what many would argue is the real world problem of white domination. So long as racist white privilege exists, and suppresses the dreams and the freedoms of human beings, so long will Du Bois be relevant as a thinker, for he, more than almost any other, employed thought in the service of exposing this privilege, and worked to eliminate it in the service of a greater humanity. Du Bois' pragmatist philosophy, as well as his other work, underlies and supports this larger social aim. Later in life, Du Bois turned to communism as the means to achieve equality. He envisioned communism as a society that promoted the well being of all its members, not simply a few. Du Bois came to believe that the economic condition of Africans and African-Americans was one of the primary modes of their oppression, and that a more equitable distribution of wealth, as advanced by Marx, was the remedy for the situation.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. General Philosophical Orientation
  3. Double Consciousness
  4. Second Sight
  5. Critique of White Imperialism
  6. Later Marxism
  7. Du Bois' Significance Today
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Du Bois was born in Great Barrington, Massachusetts, on February 23, 1868. He had a happy early childhood, largely unaware of race prejudice, until one day, as he records in Souls of Black Folk, a student in his class refused to exchange greeting cards with him simply because he was black (Souls, 2). This experience made Du Bois feel for the first time that he was different, in that he was both inside the white world (since he lived within it) and outside of it (since he was perceived in the white world through the lens of race prejudice). Throughout his life after this event, Du Bois was continually made to feel, as he says, that he was both an American and an African, but never an African-American, with his own distinct, coherent identity in the American world. "One ever feels his two-ness," he explains (Souls, 2).

Du Bois refused to become depressed by his new realization, and in fact made it his life's work to combat race prejudice and to find a way to achieve coherent personhood for blacks in America. Du Bois, it turns out, was just the right person for the job, since he had it in his character to affirm himself as a matter of course. He was a bold, courageous youth, willing to fight for himself and his peers. All his life Du Bois was self-assertive without being aggressive, assuming without hesitation the right to equality of all people.

Knowing his mission early on, Du Bois headed to school to become educated adequately to realize it (a task not without struggle in the virulently racist world of the times). He attended Fisk University as an undergraduate student and Harvard University as a graduate student as well as studied abroad in Germany. He was the first African-American to be awarded a Ph.D. from Harvard. At Harvard, he studied philosophy under William James, George Santayana, and Josiah Royce. Du Bois learned a lot from his philosophy teachers, especially James, but he came to reject academic philosophy, referring to it as "lovely but sterile" (Lewis, Biography 92). He turned to history and sociology instead.

Du Bois' dissertation reflects this new direction. It is entitled The Suppression of the African Slave Trade to the United States of America, 1638-1870. Du Bois began to turn his energies to a socio-economic analysis of the African-American situation. His efforts were guided by the belief that a proper understanding of this situation would help eliminate racism; if people only understood properly what African-Americans were going through, Du Bois felt, they would appreciate better the circumstances that they face and would work toward their full liberation and flourishing. This line of thought led to the publication of The Philadelphia Negro in 1899.

Du Bois' most important work, The Souls of Black Folk, was published in 1903, and reflects an important new direction of his thinking. This is the work for which he is most renowned, the work in which he declared, famously, that "the problem of the Twentieth Century is the problem of the color-line" (Souls, V). About this work, Du Bois' biographer writes, "It was one of those events epochally dividing history into a before and an after" (Lewis, Biography 277). What makes this work so important, culturally, is the way in which it speaks out passionately and uncompromisingly about the spirit of African-Americans, emphasizing their humanity and strength despite centuries of the worst oppression. In addition, Du Bois in this book dared to challenge the most famous African-American intellectual of the day, Booker T. Washington, and to assert an opposing principle to Washington's belief that industrial education alone would lead to equality. Du Bois argued instead that African-Americans must be given the chance to attain the most sophisticated, higher education as well, so that they might partake of the goods of civilization as well as be fit candidates to educate other African-Americans in turn (a task not to be left fully to whites).

The Souls of Black Folk is a work rich in philosophical content, as will be discussed in more detail below. For now, however, it should be noted that Du Bois shifts direction in this work and takes a novel approach from his previous work. Still trying to build understanding and sympathy for the situation of African-Americans, especially in the period after Reconstruction, Du Bois now combines socio-economic research with poetry, song, story, and philosophy. A new, multi-faceted voice grips Du Bois, allowing him, in what can only be called a great and profound piece of literature, to pierce the mind of his readers and to make them feel overwhelmingly the significance of being black in America.

In his middle works, most notably Darkwater, published in 1919, Du Bois changes directions again, as Manning Marable notes (Marable, vi). This time, instead of trying to make the reader gently understand, Du Bois lambastes the reader for failing to understand. Darkwater is a fiery, accosting work, in which Du Bois makes such claims as that "white Christianity is a miserable failure" because of its racism (Darkwater, 21), and that white civilization is to a large extent "mutilation and rape masquerading as culture" (Darkwater, 21). Du Bois' new approach consists of the attempt to wake up the reader from their racist slumber, to force them to see the racism wherever it is for what it is.

This work, in which Du Bois asserts that, "a belief in humanity is a belief in colored men" (Darkwater, 27), has become particularly important for later, critical race theory (see below). It is worth noting about the work for now that again Du Bois blends philosophy, poetry, literature, history, and sociology in a unique, energizing manner that was to remain his stylistic trademark.

Du Bois' later works include Dusk of Dawn (1940), his "autobiography of a concept of race." It also includes Black Folk, Then and Now: An Essay in the History and Sociology of the Negro Race (1939), in which he endorses a form of Marxist critique, and the posthumously published Autobiography of W. E. B. Du Bois (1968), which contains reflections on his life in its last decade.

Throughout his life, in addition to writing, Du Bois worked as an activist for social causes. He was editor of the journal, Crisis (1910-1919), which explored contemporary racial problems and how to combat them. He helped found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People (NAACP) as well as the Pan African Congress. He ran for the U.S. Senate in order to help improve the plight of African Americans. Later in life, as the chair of the Peace Information Center, he called for banishing atomic weapons and making them illegal (Lewis; Hynes).

In 1959, after a lifetime of combating rampant racism in the U.S., Du Bois had enough and expatriated to Ghana, Africa. He spent his time in Africa working on an Encyclopedia of African Peoples and refining his social analysis, which had come to include Marxist elements (he became an official member of the U.S. Communist Party before his departure). Du Bois died in Accra, Ghana, on August 27, 1963---immediately before the March on Washington that inaugurated the civil rights movement in America, as several commentators have observed (Lewis; Hynes).

2. General Philosophical Orientation

Philosophically speaking, Du Bois' work is difficult to characterize, since he lived and wrote for such a long time and refined his position over so many years. Eugene C. Holmes has described Du Bois as a materialist and a social philosopher (Holmes, 80-1). According to Holmes, "with Dr. Du Bois...it was always the problem of getting the truth about race by means of a scientific approach" (Holmes, 77).

Recent scholarship has adopted a more nuanced perspective. Cornel West puts Du Bois decidedly in the camp of the pragmatists, that is, in the camp of someone who works in the "Emersonian tradition" of evading traditional philosophical problems altogether and turning instead to the empowerment of individuals and communities. What Du Bois adds to the pragmatists, according to West, is an impassioned and focused concern for "the wretched of the earth" and for thinking about how one can alleviate their plight (West, 138). Other more recent approaches tend to see Du Bois as a highly important critical theorist, or someone whose work is inherently and purposefully interdisciplinary in nature, drawing on multiple disciplines as needed to critique power, especially white power (Rabaka, 2). This view would seemed to be confirmed by Du Bois' biographer, who concludes his painstakingly thorough account of Du Bois' life and work by noting that Du Bois, in essence, "attempted virtually every possible solution to the problem of twentieth century racism---scholarship, propaganda...international communism" (Lewis, The Fight for Equality, 571). Hence, the traditional view of Du Bois as always concerned with getting at the truth about race through science would seem to be contradicted by recent scholarship, which holds that Du Bois tried multiple, irreconcilable approaches (even propaganda) to achieve his ends.

Even so, there remains important recent scholarship that sees Du Bois as a more traditional philosopher, concerned with the ideals of truth, goodness, and beauty. According to Keith Byerman, for example, Du Bois possesses "confidence in his grasp of truth," and his autobiographies, for one, are stories in which he always gains "a fuller view of truth" (Byerman, 7). The truth that Du Bois realizes, according to Byerman, is that there is a "Law of the Father," which "challenges the corrupt father... By supplanting the father, the son can install an "empire" of reason, morality, and beauty to replace arbitrary power and self-interest" (Byerman, 7-8). On this reading, which is Platonic in many ways, truth, goodness, and beauty are ideal qualities by appeal to which Du Bois judges and condemns the corrupt world of racial inequality.

Overall, then, we can see that the general interpretation of Du Bois' philosophy is contested ground, and that no clear-cut, agreed-upon definition of it emerges from the scholarship. Some Continental Philosophers have even identified Du Bois as Hegelian in a crucial respect (or at least as having "held out as ideal" one of Hegel's main goals) (Higgins, 58). The point is made that, like Hegel, the Du Boisian self is also torn asunder, divided within itself, only to have to struggle to attain a higher synthesis of identity in a new formation. Materialist, Pragmatist, Critical Theorist, Platonist, Hegelian---Du Bois' general philosophical orientation is far from having been finally determined.

3. Double Consciousness

Whatever turns out to be the best general account of Du Bois' philosophy, it seems the significance of his thought only really shows up in the specific details of his works themselves, especially in The Souls of Black Folk. It is here that he first develops his central philosophical concept, the concept of double consciousness, and spells out its full implications.

The aim of Souls of Black Folk is to show the spirit of black people in the United States: to show their humanity and the predicament that has confronted their humanity. Du Bois asserts that "the color line" divides people in the States, causes massive harm to its inhabitants, and ruins its own pretensions to democracy. He shows, in particular, how a veil has come to be put over African-Americans, so that others do not see them as they are; African-Americans are obscured in America; they cannot be seen clearly, but only through the lens of race prejudice. African-Americans feel this alien perception upon them but at the same time feel themselves as themselves, as their own with their own legitimate feelings and traditions. This dual self-perception is known as "double consciousness." Du Bois' aim in Souls is to explain this concept in more specific detail and to show how it adversely affects African-Americans. In the background of Souls is always also the moral import of its message, to the effect that the insertion of a veil on human beings is wrong and must be condemned on the grounds that it divides what otherwise would be a unique and coherent identity. Souls thus aims to make the reader understand, in effect, that African-Americans have a distinct cultural identity, one that must be acknowledged, respected, and enabled to flourish.

Souls contains a Forethought, fourteen chapters, and an Afterthought. Each chapter is preceded by a bar of African-American spiritual music coupled with a poem.

The Forethought tells us the plan of the work: to present "the spiritual world in which ten thousand Americans live and strive" (Souls, v). Chapter 1, "Of Our Spiritual Strivings," is perhaps the most important chapter of the book from a strictly philosophical perspective. Here Du Bois lays out the basic concept of double consciousness, while the remainder of the work provides concrete instances of the concept. The Afterthought, rich and powerful in poetic imagery, implores the reader not to let Du Bois' "leaves" fail to take root: it is an impassioned call to action based on the book's insights.

"An American, a Negro; two souls, two thoughts, two unreconciled strivings"---with these words from Chapter 1, Du Bois highlights the extreme tension involved in double consciousness (Souls, 2). Or, as he also expresses the point, "Why did God make me an outcast and a stranger in mine own house?" (Souls, 2). Double consciousness is the awareness of being a split person, a dual self whose different parts are at dire odds with one another. The American self in a person, such as America was then constituted, works against the Negro self; while the Negro self, resisting as it must such a constitution, works against the American self. In one person, therefore, we have two deeply divided tendencies.

Du Bois does not conceive this division to be a good thing; he conceives it, indeed, as positively unhealthy and problematic. He refers to it as "this waste of double aims, this seeking to satisfy two unreconciled ideals," which "has wrought sad havoc with the courage and faith and deeds of ten thousand people" (Souls, 3). Not knowing which particular direction to turn, always fighting against oneself in either direction, what double consciousness prevents is the attainment of "self-conscious manhood," a coherent sense of self and direction, the ability "to merge his double self into a better and truer self" (Souls, 2).

In Du Bois' conception, the human self is thus capable of being cut or split, and at the same time capable of growing back together again and becoming, as he says, better and even more true. Of course, a truer self implies something like truth---and thus we can see that Du Bois holds to the idea of a more genuine ideal of a person, specifically of African-Americans. Du Bois' idea is that African-Americans have in truth a unique, valuable identity but that current conditions keep this identity from forming or at least becoming fully active and available. We can see here, too, Du Bois' famous call for allowing African-Americans to become genuine participants in American culture, "to be a co-worker in the kingdom of culture" (Souls, 3), in such a way that American culture could only benefit by the inclusion of its own genuine members. Du Bois does not wish to eliminate white American culture nor Negro culture in America. He wishes to fuse the two into a genuine new element, "in order that some day on American soil two world-races may give each to each those characteristics both so sadly lack" (Souls, 7). Through recognition of a place for African-Americans in American culture, Du Bois wishes to achieve a genuine American culture as well: "the ideal of human brotherhood, gained through the unifying ideal of Race" (Souls, 7).

In the remaining chapters of Souls, Du Bois provides some rather powerful (and tragic) instances of the struggles with dual selfhood that African-Americans have had to undergo. A key idea of Chapter 1 is to show what Reconstruction meant for African-Americans: the chance not only to be free, and educated, and to have the vote, but more importantly (as Du Bois argues it) to become whole human beings. Chapter 2 examines the aftermath of Reconstruction and shows how Reconstruction (in the form of the Freedmen's Bureau) at first worked slowly toward, but then ultimately failed to achieve, this ideal. Chapter 3 continues to show how the ideal failed to develop by pointing to the slow and ineffective rise of leadership of African-Americans. It is in this chapter that Du Bois famously challenges Booker T. Washington for his call to lead blacks through industrial education without the inclusion of higher learning. How, Du Bois reasons, can African-Americans become "co-workers in the kingdom of culture" if they are only trained in the sterile practice of moneymaking? In Chapters 4 and 5, Du Bois takes his readers further into the idea of the veil, taking a look both inside it and outside in each chapter, respectively. By Chapter 6, we realize that the main problem in achieving coherent personhood for African-Americans is education. Chapters 7 and 8 outline the struggles that the masses of African-American workers, in particular, have undergone. Chapter 9 turns toward the present relations between African-Americans and white Americans. It focuses, in particular, on the manners and modes of segregation that keep the best of whites living apart from the best of African-Americans, thereby preventing a fruitful fusion of cultures. In Chapter 10, Du Bois purports to lift the veil, so that whites can see inside and especially appreciate the religious sense and striving of African Americans. He shows that the meaning of the religion is that it constitutes a special place where the kind of community and life for African-Americans can be attained that the white world denies them. Religion has had to become a refuge, but also at the same time a source of genuine freedom of expression and creativity. Chapter 11, which is very moving, recounts the birth (and loss) of Du Bois' own son as an instance of his own struggle against white culture. Here Du Bois laments that his newborn, innocent son will soon have to cross into the color line of hateful American prejudice. Chapters 12 and 13 discuss the struggles that great African-American souls had to deal with to become more fully appreciated, including a narrative about a man named John who defended his sister against dishonor only to be met with horrible racism as a result. Chapter 14, the last chapter, closes with a rich discussion of African-American music in which Du Bois points to this music as an emblem of the possible brighter future in which African-Americans become co-workers in American culture. Such music is the symbol of this better future in which African-Americans contribute to the culture since it is, after all, he claims, the only genuinely beautiful music that has come out of America to date, and reveals what African-Americans can accomplish.

Thus, Du Bois provides us with multiple instances of double consciousness. In each case, African-Americans are shown to be struggling to achieve themselves, due to the enforced divisions and roadblocks of white culture. What Du Bois presents here are short, powerful looks at the struggle to be recognized as fully human, a struggle due to the horrible crime of racism. The concept of double consciousness plays itself out in a variety of ways---from the agonizing worry a father feels in raising his son in a white world to the failed policies of segregation and the creation of ghettos in American cities---always with the same devastating effect, the compromising of identity, and yet with a new identity that is forming and emerging. The African-American is forced to struggle to be him- or herself in America, Du Bois shows, but they have done so heroically and with deep humanity throughout their plight.

Some Du Bois interpreters (Higgins) have found parallels between Du Bois' conception of double consciousness and Nietzsche's conception of the free spirit, or the man who stands apart. The idea is that in both cases someone within the culture is at the same time able to stand outside of it. But as we have seen above, beyond this general notion, Du Bois clearly develops his concept of double consciousness in the context of African-Americans specifically. Nor does he favor this sense of division in the way that Nietzsche sometimes seems to do but rather he actively seeks to overcome it.

The overall implication of Souls is that such enforced separation of consciousness as occurs in the case of African-Americans is wrong; it violates something fundamental about the human condition, and it ruins our republic, by preventing us from forming the best use of our talents by drawing on the strengths of all races. We must work together to attain a greater sense of personhood for the members of our culture.

4. Second Sight

Du Bois' other major philosophical concept is that of "second sight." This is a concept he develops most precisely in Darkwater, a work, as we have seen, in which Du Bois changes his approach and takes up a stauncher stance against white culture.

Du Bois holds that due to their double consciousness, African-Americans possess a privileged epistemological perspective. Both inside the white world and outside of it, African-Americans are able to understand the white world, while yet perceiving it from a different perspective, namely that of an outsider as well.

The white person in America, by contrast, contains but a single consciousness and perspective, for he or she is a member of a dominant culture, with its own racial and cultural norms asserted as absolute. The white person looks out from themselves and sees only their own world reflected back upon them---a kind of blindness or singular sight possesses them. Luckily, as Du Bois makes clear, the dual perspective of African-Americans can be used to grasp the essence of whiteness and to expose it, in the multiple senses of the word "expose." That is to say, second sight allows an African-American to bring the white view out into the open, to lay it bare, and to let it wither for the problematic and wrong-headed concept that it is. The destruction of "whiteness" in this way leaves whites open to the experience of African-Americans, as a privileged perspective, and hence it also leaves African-Americans with a breach in the culture through which they could enter with their legitimate, and legitimating, perspectives.

5. Critique of White Imperialism

In a particularly important essay of Dark Water, called "The Souls of White Folk," Du Bois reveals some of the wisdom of his race's privileged perspective. As Du Bois sees it, whites see themselves a certain way, namely as superior, civilized, perfect, beneficent, and called upon to help other peoples with their higher wisdom. But, in truth, as African-Americans can perceive quite plainly, whites are actually imperialistic, ugly, greedy, and corrupt in their practices. Whites are imprisoned in their own false self-conception. Their own seriousness with themselves contrasts sharply with the reality that African-Americans see. What they see, above all, is that white society consists not of higher wisdom but only of "mutilation and rape masquerading as culture" (Darkwater, 21).

Du Bois makes his claims more pointed and specific by noting that the concept of "whiteness" is what we might today call a social construct. It is a concept that developed in the late nineteenth century and in the twentieth century. Before that, various societies hardly made much of differences in skin color. What is significant about this fact is that it shows whiteness as a category to emerge simultaneously with the development of industrialism and its counterpart colonialism. Western peoples wanted the material resources of the third world, and so they invented the myth of their own superiority based on skin color, and the supposed inferiority of dark peoples, in order to assist them in their desire to steal.

Based on such maneuvers as these, the third world was conquered, dark peoples were murdered, raped, and exploited, and white culture became rich. This wealth and power in turn gave whites a sense of superiority. But this sense of superiority is undone by the tragic-comic self-conception whites have of themselves as superior simply because they are white, when in fact they are bound to a false, invented self-conception based on color, one that only serves to assist in murder and exploitation. The supposedly civilized concept of "whiteness" in truth sinks into barbarism and insatiable world conquest.

And it is this, precisely, that whites cannot see about themselves, but must learn to see, if the problem of the twentieth century, the problem of the color line, is to be overcome and the races are to create together a greater and truer democracy.

6. Later Marxism

Later in life, Du Bois turned to communism as the means to achieve equality. As he put it in his autobiography, "I now state my conclusion frankly and clearly: I believe in communism. I mean by communism, a planned way of life in the production of wealth and work designed for building a state whose object is the highest welfare of its people and not merely the profit of a part" (Autobiography, 57). Du Bois came to believe that the economic condition of Africans and African-Americans was one of the primary modes of their oppression, and that a more equitable distribution of wealth, as advanced by Marx, was the remedy to the situation.

Du Bois was not simply a follower of Marx, however. He also added keen insights to the communist tradition himself. One of his contributions is his insistence that communism contains no explicit means of liberating Africans and African-Americans, but that it ought to focus its attentions here and work toward this end. "The darker races," to use Du Bois' language, amount to the majority of the world's proletariat. Without their liberation and motive force in the production of communism, it cannot be achieved. In Black Folk, Then and Now, Du Bois writes: "the dark workers of Asia, Africa, the islands of the sea, and South and Central America...these are the one who are supporting a superstructure of wealth, luxury, and extravagance. It is the rise of these people that is the rise of the world" (Black Folk, 383).

A further contribution Du Bois makes is to show how Utopian politics such as communism is possible in the first place. Building on Engle's claim that freedom lies in the acknowledgment of necessity, as Maynard Solomon argues (Solomon, "Introduction" 258), (because in grasping necessity we accurately perceive what areas of life are open to free action), Du Bois insists on the power of dreams. Admitting our bound nature (bound to our bellies, bound to material conditions), even stressing it, he nonetheless emphasizes our range of powers within these constraints. In a lecture called "The Nature of Intellectual Freedom" that he delivered to the Cultural and Scientific Conference for World Peace in 1949, using language that anticipates Jean-Paul Sartre, Du Bois calls attention to "the upsurging emotions," the mind's ability to go beyond what is present (259). Also like Sartre, Du Bois attempts to employ this power behalf of socialism. As Du Bois sees it, the human mind has the ability to take flight into "infinite freedoms" ("The Nature," 259). This "upsurging" ability of mind is vital to bringing about socialism, for it allows us to dream of what life and social conditions might be as compared to what they currently are (Solomon, "Introduction," 258). If properly cultivated, it allows us to see beyond the supposed necessity of the capitalist system, which everywhere presents itself, falsely, as the only way. Imagination surpasses untruth.

There is, as Du Bois points out ("The Nature," 260), and Solomon confirms (Solomon, "Introduction," 258), a "borderland" region in which compulsion and freedom meet. We must gain food, seek shelter, and raise our children. Necessity and liberty meet each other half way in this region, each pulling in their own direction, yet oftentimes working together. Our leaders take advantage of this region. They enforce necessity to work hard and to work in order to eat---in order, ultimately, to stifle individual freedom and its meanderings, its free decisions; and they promote ignorance of conditions in order to make us more beholden to them. However, there is hope in the fact that freedom also operates in this border region and that our minds can shape a part of what occurs in this region. Socialism must focus here and nurture this hope. It must promote, above all, "the dreaming of dreams by untwisted souls," that our dreams might someday lead to better realities ("The Nature," 260).

7. Du Bois' Significance Today

Although difficult to characterize in general terms, Du Bois' philosophy amounts to a programmatic shift away from abstraction and toward engaged, social criticism. In affecting this change in philosophy, especially on behalf of African-Americans and pertaining to the issue of race, Du Bois adds concrete significance and urgent application to American Pragmatism, as Cornel West maintains, a philosophy that is about social criticism, not about grasping absolute timeless truth.

Du Bois' work has also been essential for Africana Critical Theory, and has influenced a host of thinkers in this tradition, as Rabaka has shown. Authors have often compared Du Bois' work to that of Frantz Fanon in its call to overcome global race prejudice and to liberate Africa. In addition, Du Bois' philosophy was a focus point for some of the work of Dr. Martin Luther King, Jr., among many other thinkers, who praised it highly for its commitment to truth about African-American experience and history (Rabaka, 35).

Du Bois' philosophy has also contributed significantly to critical race theory, especially his article, "The Conservation of Races," in which Du Bois argues, echoing Souls, that there is some real meaning to race, even if it is difficult precisely to define (Conservation, 84-85). As Robert Bernasconi makes clear, Du Bois is a central figure in the debate about the nature of race because he has triggered an intense discussion about the extent to which there is a biological basis to race and the extent to which social and cultural features define race as well ("Introduction," 1-2).

With his concept of second sight, and the privileged perspective of minorities, Du Bois also anticipates, if not single handedly creates, Standpoint Theory in epistemology, which holds that minorities are better equipped to gain knowledge about the world than members of the dominant culture. Du Bois' social philosophy also adds an important element to Marxism by focusing on the racial elements of oppression and their function in relation to class warfare. Moreover, his philosophy also anticipates certain French Feminists, such as Luce Irigaray, who demonstrate how culture mirrors back to us the image of our selves to the detriment of minorities.

Above all, however, Du Bois' philosophy is significant today because it addresses what many would argue is the real world problem of white domination. So long as racist white privilege exists, and suppresses the dreams and the freedoms of human beings, so long will Du Bois be relevant as a thinker, for he, more than almost any other, employed thought in the service of exposing this privilege, and worked to eliminate it in the service of a greater humanity.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bernasconi, Robert. "Introduction," in Race, ed. Robert Bernasconi (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2001).
  • Byerman, Keith E. Seizing the Word: History, Art, and Self in the Work of W. E. B. Du Bois (Athens: University of Georgia Press, 1994).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Black Folk, Then and Now (Millwood, N.Y.: Kraus-Thomson Organization Limited, 1975).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Darkwater: Voices From Within the Veil (Mineola, N. Y. Dover Publications, 1999).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Dusk of Dawn: An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept (New York: Schocken Books, 1968).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Autobiography of W. E. B. Du Bois: A Soliloquy on Viewing My Life from the Last Decade of its First Century (New York: International Publishers, 1980).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Conservation of Races," in Race, ed. Robert Bernasconi (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2001).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Nature of Intellectual Freedom," in Solomon, Maynard, ed., Marxism and Art: Essays Classic and Contemporary (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Souls of Black Folk (New York: Dover Publications, 1994).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Talented Tenth." 3/13/2006. <www.teachingamericanhistory.org/library/index.asp?documentprint=174>.
  • Harding, Sandra. The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader: Intellectual and Political Controversies (London: Routledge, 2003).
  • Higgins, Kathleen. "Double Consciousness and Second Sight," in Critical Affinities: Nietzsche and African American Thought, ed., Jacqueline Scott and A. Todd Franklin (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2006).
  • Holmes, Eugene C. "W. E. B. Du Bois: Philosopher," in Black Titan: W. E. B. Du Bois (Boston: Beacon Press, 1970).
  • Hynes, Gerald C. "A Biographical Sketch of W. E. B. Du Bois." 3/10/2006. http://www. Duboislc.org/html/DuBoisBio.html.
  • Irigaray, Luce. Speculum of the Other Woman. Trans. Gillian G. Gill (New York: Cornell University Press, 1974).
  • Lewis, David Levering. W. E. B. Du Bois: Biography of a Race: 1868-1919 (New York: Henry Holt, 1993).
  • Lewis, David Levering. W. E. B. Du Bois: The Fight for Equality and the American Century: 1919-1963 (New York: Henry Holt, 2000).
  • Marable, Manning, "Introduction," Darkwater: Voices From Within the Veil. By W. E. B. Du Bois (Mineola, N. Y. Dover Publications, 1999), v-viii.
  • Marable, Manning. W.E.B. Du Bois: Black Radical Democrat (Boulder, Colorado: Paradigm Publishers, 2005).
  • Rabaka, Reiland. W. E. B. Du Bois and the Problems of the Twenty-First Century: An Essay on Africana Critical Theory (Lanham, MD.: Lexington Books, 2007).
  • Solomon, Maynard, "Introduction," in Marxism and Art: Essays Classic and Contemporary, Ed., Maynard Solomon (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • West, Cornel. The American Evasion of Philosophy: A Genealogy of Pragmatism (Madison, WI: The University of Wisconsin Press, 1989).

Author Information

Donald J. Morse
Email: dmorse@webster.edu
Webster University
U. S. A.

Chauncey Wright (1830—1875)

Chauncey_WrightChauncey Wright, an American mathematician, philosopher, and intellectual catalyst of the Septum and the Metaphysical club at Cambridge, was a great influence on Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, Oliver Wendell Holmes, and Nicholas St. John Green. Unfortunately, Wright’s untimely death at the age of forty-five severed his growing influence on the direction of early-classical American philosophy, just when his intellectual powers were reaching their peek. Apart from some recent studies on his work, spearheaded by the eminent Wright scholar Edward H. Madden, his keen perspectives have been overlooked by both classical and contemporary American philosophers. As a thinker of the transition from early to classical American philosophy, Wright’s work captures the best of Scottish realism, English empiricism, and early science studies, especially in mathematics, physics, biology, meteorology, psychology, jurisprudence, and pedagogy, combining to establish his influence as a well-rounded, critic of system building, metaphysics, theological influence, and the imprecise use of language. His critical empiricism positioned him against any fusion of teleology in philosophy and science. He was one of the first supporters and careful readers of the work of Charles Darwin in the States, winning praise from Darwin for his clear minded approach and style, especially in his work on evolutionary psychology. Wright’s letters are the clearest testaments to his dynamic and personable style. They are exemplary of his patience and depth of cultural preparedness and prime examples of what he must have been like as a Socratic dialogue partner and “intellectual boxing master,” as C.S. Peirce stated. The collected reviews and essays by Wright demonstrate his range and precision of argument, though many reviews and scientific essays still remain uncollected. As his friend John Fiske wrote, “to have known such a man is an experience one cannot forget or outlive, and to have him pass away, leaving so scanty a record of what he had it in him to utter, is nothing less than a public calamity.”

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
    1. Letters
  2. The Language and Philosophy of Science
    1. Mathematics and Adequate Nomenclature
    2. Cosmology as “Cosmic Weather”
    3. Evolution as Theory of Natural Selection
  3. Theory of Knowledge
  4. History of Philosophy
  5. Pedagogy and the Philosophy of Education
  6. Recollections, Influence, and Critical Reception
  7. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Work

Chauncey Wright, mathematician, philosopher, was born at Northamptom, Massachusetts, September 20, 1830. He entered Harvard College in 1848, where he graduated twenty-seventh in a class of eighty-eight in 1852. From 1852 to 1870 Wright was employed as a computing machine for the American Ephemeris and Nautical Almanac at Cambridge, turning series of numbers into logarithms and vice versa, computing charts (ephemerids) for navigation based on the positions of the fixed stars, moon, sun and other planets. Wright taught natural philosophy at the Agassiz School for Girls from 1859 to 1860. He was elected a fellow of the American Academy of Arts and Science in 1860. In January 1870 he was offered a lecture series on psychology at Harvard College as part of the new post-graduate courses. These lectures were based on and developed from what was found in the work of the Scottish philosopher Alexander Bain (1818-1903). The lecture series, begun by Harvard’s former president Thomas Hill, had been revitalized by the then president C.W. Eliot, who also secured lectures from R.W. Emerson, W.D. Howells, F. Bôcher, C.S. Peirce, O. W. Holmes Jr., and J.Fiske. In 1874 and 1875 Wright also lectured in theoretical physics. This was the extent of Wright’s college teaching experience, and though not successful in a classroom setting, his reflections on education and pedagogy were inspiring to his friend, fellow classmate, and Dean of Harvard College, Prof. E. W. Gurney. Gurney describes how “[Wright had] some ten clever sophomores in the course; but his heavy artillery was mostly directed over their heads. They complained much to me (as Dean) of their inability to follow him; but Chauncey, with the best intentions, found it almost impossible to accommodate his pace to their short stride. His examination-papers, by the way, in this course, I remember as models of what such papers should be. Chauncey had as sound views on the subject of education, as fresh and original, and as little biased by his own peculiar training and deficiencies of sympathy, as those of anybody I ever listened to, but he has no adaptability in practice.” (Letters 212-213).

Wright’s pedagogical talents were better seen in his being a private tutor, philosophical mentor, and intellectual catalyst of both the “Cambridge Septum Club” and the “Metaphysical Club” in Cambridge. It was through the discussions and papers presented at these gatherings that Wright came to be known and respected as the “intellectual boxing master” to Charles Sanders Peirce, William James and Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr. Also present at these gatherings were Nicholas St. John Green (1830-1876), Joseph Warner, Frank E. Abbot, and John Fiske. The scientist-philosophers of The Metaphysical Club were nearly outnumbered by members who were lawyers (Fisch 1942; Wiener 1948). Wright died in Cambridge, Massachusetts on September 12, 1875.

Wright published fifty-six articles between 1865 and 1875, the last published posthumously in 1876 in the American Naturalist. These ranged from book notices and reviews to longer technical philosophical and scientific essays. Except for his presentations to the Septum Club, and the Metaphysical Club, all lost to us except in short citations and titles mentioned in his letters, these articles are what remain of his work. He published in The Atlantic Monthly, The Mathematical Monthly, The North American Review, The Nation, Memoirs of the Academy of Arts and Sciences, Proceedings of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, and the American Naturalist. Eighteen of his longer articles were collected and published in 1877 by his friend Charles Eliot Norton under the title Philosophical Discussions. There exists one generously detailed review, though anonymous, of this text from The Nation, dated May 17, 1877, vol. 24, n. 620, pp. 294-296. In it we find written how “[Wright’s works] form the most important contributions which now chiefly engage the attention of the students of philosophy,” and further, how “it was only Mr. Wright’s neglect to preserve his thoughts in writing that prevented him”, citing John Fiske “from taking rank among the foremost philosophers of the nineteenth century.” In a letter of recommendation that William James wrote on Peirce’s behalf to Prof. Gilman of Chicago, dated November 25, 1875, he stated, “I don’t think it extravagant praise to say that of late years there has been no intellect in Cambridge of such general powers and originality as [Peirce], unless one should except the late Chauncey Wright, and effectively, Peirce will always rank higher than Wright” (James, Correspondence, Vol. 4).

a. Letters

Chauncey Wright maintained a lively and inspiring correspondence throughout his life. It is from these letters that we may approach his conversational genius. Thanks to his friend from childhood James Bradley Thayer, these were collected and privately printed in 1878.

Wright’s letters act as a primer, glossary, and journal to connect and clarify his published philosophical perspectives, while revealing the life and dialogue of one of the great pioneers in the history of early classical American philosophy of science, metaphysics, ethics and pedagogy. Although Wright mentioned that “letter-writing [was] still odious to [him]”, just two months before his death, he added, “I think it is, but so that the good of it, the Promethean endurance and philanthropy of it, is set off on high artistic principles against its evils, the vexatious stupidities of Cadmean invention” (Letters 344). It is through these letters, crafted to a high artistic principle that a study on Chauncey Wright begins in earnest, followed by his collected works in the volume entitled Philosophical Discussions (1877). This would, in the words of his friend William James (1842-1910), allow us to see “his tireless amiability, his beautiful modesty, his affectionate nature and freedom from egotism [and] his childlike simplicity in worldly affairs” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 4).

2. The Language and Philosophy of Science

For Wright, the philosophy of science as a general theory of the universe was not a main concern. He was actually a critic of such formulations and systems, a critic of anything that began to resemble metaphysical web-spinning, as seen in the works of Herbert Spencer (1820-1903). For Wright, science, or “true science”, does not base itself on any “principle of Authority” which would include principles which are linguistically construed to substitute for dogma and superstition. Science should not be a substitute system for the lost innocence of theological speculations, nor be tainted by a teleological nature. Wright believed “true science deals with nothing but questions of facts [which] if possible, shall not be determined beforehand [nor by] how we ought to feel about the facts … nor by moral biases” (Letters 113). As part of this position he was interested and critically tuned to the issues of “motives” that generated theories. As he wrote to F.E. Abbot, “no real fate or necessity is indeed manifested anywhere in the universe, only a phenomenal regularity” (Letters 111). Many years later, in 1932, Justice Oliver W. Holmes (1841-1935) recalls this point, stating Wright “taught me when young that I must not say necessary about the universe, that we don’t know whether anything is necessary or not. So I describe myself as a bettabilitarian. I believe we can bet on the behavior of the universe in its contact with us.” Much of Wright’s position and amicable critique of the theories of science (or attempts at being “scientific”) can be seen in his letters to F.E. Abbot (1836-1903), Mrs. Lesley and Miss Grace Norton, followed by the longer more technical articles collected in Philosophical Discussions, most notably “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer”, “Evolution by Natural Selection”, “Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, “The Conflict of Studies”, and “A Fragment on Cause and Effect”. Many of Wright’s as-of-yet uncollected review articles also contain important statements regarding his critique of, and position on the philosophy of science. The study of these articles should clarify Wright’s non-partisan view of the use of science, his accommodation of what today we would call “complexity”, his care for precision in the use of terms and definitions employed in experimental methods, and his caution against the metaphysical adaptation of science that haunted many fanciful theories of the time. Wright was cautious in focusing on what he saw as the “two uses of language – the social and the meditative, or mnemonic”. Only in their strict exchange and study would a clear language for science become possible (“Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, in Philosophical Discussions 255). For Wright, without the developed power of primary perception and attention, the meditative use of language breeds nothing but trite metaphysical glossaries, a type of false memory (projected recollections), and ultimately vague and dogmatic principles product of a faulty, unchecked use of terms and definitions. Wright sought “scientific distinctness” over “moral connotations” (Letters 112). As he wrote to Miss Grace Norton (July 29, 1874), “we suffer from a mental indigestion. We have not solved the ambiguity of words” (Letters 275). Here, as the preeminent Wright scholar E. H. Madden stated, “the concept of substance [which Wright takes to task] arises from misleading metaphors in the syntax of language [and] is not unlike modern neo-Wittgensteinian analysis” (“Wright, James, and Radical Empiricism,” The Journal of Philosophy, LI, 1954, 871). The influence in the philosophy of language is due to in part to Nicholas St. John Green, a legal scholar, and in how Green believed that “a real definition is an analysis”. This was written during Green’s involvement with the Metaphysical Club.For Wright. Language is not, nor should be used as a “lying device”, which is a “false instinct in a rational being”, a drive to return to pre-linguistic “animal oblivion” which can be dressed up in the disdain for the science and clarity of terms as seen in the works of Herbert Spencer (1820-1903), and especially in those of the Rev. James Martineau (1805-1900). Wright called this type of philosophizing “poetry under the form of science, of which Hegelianism is the most notable modern epic” (Letters 179).

A compelling reflection on the question and power of language is seen in Wright’s letter to Charles Darwin (1809-1882), dated August 29, 1872 (Letters 240-246). With a clear use of terms and a sustained use of the nature of inference, Wright believed that we could extend, check, and use our knowledge of the study of nature as tools and extensions of careful perceptions. For Wright theoretical concepts should not be used as static summaries of truth, but as ever-active non-generalized “finders”. “Finders” are the use we make of working hypotheses through testable consequences open to future experiences. “Finders” are not hardened metaphysical concepts. They are speculative tools that may arise from experience, intuitions, dreams and imagination. For Wright the language and philosophy of science must be passed through the “tools of sensible experience”, not be concerned with “ontological pedigree or a priori character of a theory”, and above all search for the driving motives of research outside fear, respect and aspiration (Philosophical Discussions 47, 49).

For such an amiable and humble individual, Wright was a very tough-minded theorist. He cautions us to realize that the positivists stage of the Theological, Metaphysical and Scientific co-exist at every level and attempt of humankind’s quest for knowledge, as well as between rival hypotheses that seek to grasp culture and nature. Wright saw the space for a true scientific attitude based upon the methods of observation and the testing of rules of investigation, not in an endless cycle of collecting hypotheses for and against said methods, rules and facts. Wright clearly followed Bacon’s lead in severing “physical science from scholastic philosophy …” (Philosophical Discussions 375). In his words, “the conscious purpose of arriving at general facts and at an adequate statement of them in language, or of bringing particular facts under explicit general ones, determines for any knowledge a scientific character” (Philosophical Discussions 205). This character must always be what Wright called “useful knowledge”, and further, “with connection in phenomena which are susceptible of demonstration by inductive observation, and independent of diversities or resemblances in their hidden nature, or of any question about their metaphysical derivation, or dependence” (Philosophical Discussions 408).

From these considerations many twentieth-century commentators, with the exception of E.H. Madden, have marked Wright as a pragmatist, or proto-pragmatist. This is not precise, since for Wright, basic empirical propositions are not open to the idea of working hypothesis at the level of matter-of-fact experience common sense beliefs, nor are long-run results safe from teleological underpinnings. Further, these basic propositions are not prone to being tested by, nor serve as, criteria of meaning. Wright avoided offering a meaning of truth, and did not generalize on the nature of thinking (Letters 325).

Wright’s prefiguring of what later came to be known in 1897 as Jamesian pragmatism and Peirce’s more trenchant “pragmaticism,” can be best understood if one relates Wright to his legal minded friends and fellow members of the Metaphysical Club. This vigor of thought and stimulus to study was carried into and from the conversations at the Metaphysical Club due to the presence of the lawyers in the group: Holmes, St. John Green, Warner and Fiske. It was especially with Nicholas St. John Green, who also taught at Harvard Law School (1870-1873), and was an instructor in philosophy, that the shared use of Alexander Bain’s and J.S. Mill’s texts would have prompted conversation on the applicability of facts, actions and rights. This direction of thought is present in Green’s article “Proximate and Remote Causes”, from the American Law Review of 1870. With Green and Holmes, Wright also shared a closer bond of the care for precision in the use of language, and in the words of Green, “a frequent cause of perplexity in law is the loose way in which legal terms are used, the same term being used to express different things” (Green, Essays and Notes on the Law of Torts and Crime, p. 146). A similar position on this precision in the use of language can be seen between Oliver Wendell Holmes and Wright and in how Holmes saw law as a study of “prediction, the prediction of the incidence of the public force through the instrumentality of the courts” (Holmes, Collected Legal Papers, 167). This was Holmes’ position from as early as 1871. Soon after that C.S. Peirce gave a talk at the Metaphysical Club, (November 1872) where he wished to pool the many conversations and ideas. Six year later, and two years after Wright’s death, Peirce published two versions of this talk as the articles, “The Fixation of Belief”, and “How to Make Our Ideas Clear.”

a. Mathematics and Adequate Nomenclature

Wright published ten articles in the field of mathematics. According to his friend and fellow mathematician Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914), Wright was a “thorough mathematician” (Ryan 2000: 188). This was indeed high praise coming from C.S. Peirce who was the son of Prof. Benjamin Peirce (1809-1880), the great American mathematician of the nineteenth century and teacher of Wright at Harvard between 1848 and 1852. Prof. Benjamin Peirce also publicly praised Wright at one of his lectures, and the modest student never appeared in class after that lecture (Letters 122). There is no doubt that Wright was influence by Prof. Peirce’s view of mathematics as the supreme science, a science that, in Peirce’s words “draws necessary conclusions.” Wright even defended Benjamin Peirce in an article left unsigned in The Nation, entitled “Mathematics in Court” (September 19, 1867).

Wright’s talent for mathematics was seen early on in his years at the High School and Select High School in Northampton, MA, and at Harvard College, where he took the elective in mathematics in his junior year. His essay on “Ancient Geometry” was mentioned in the 1852 Commencement Program. Wright continually strove for the precision of terms and form which he found so clearly present in mathematics. In a letter dated October 1864, (most likely to F.E. Abbot) he stated that “mathematician are the most exacting of purists, since, having none but perfectly adequate nomenclature, they are intolerant of, and, as one may confess, also insensible to any thought not set forth in exact form.” In Wright’s substantial review article entitled “The Conflict of Studies” (Philosophical Discussions 267-295), one may explore Wright’s perspective on the use and abuse of mathematics and its teaching. We find how Wright championed the imaginative use of memory, a training that would loosen it from the shackles of projected route memorization. Wright’s coupling of mathematics and pedagogical techniques with the recreational are telling. It is here that his influence on friends must have been most powerful, because he believed that play is a useful character or drive that overcomes the repetitive and droll “irksome exercises”. An example of this exchange exists in a letter written by C.S. Peirce to Wright dated September 2, 1865 found at the American Philosophical Society in Philadelphia, PA. Peirce’s letters explains three card tricks, fully described and then explained by mathematical calculus. This, one quickly realizes is how mathematical genius is seen at play, and how such exuberance was transformed into high-level critique and discussion. It is unfortunate that Wright’s response is lost to us.

The earliest of the mathematical works of Wright is on “The Prismoidal Formula” (The Mathematical Monthly, October, 1858). In April 1859 he published the article “The Most Thorough Uniform Distribution of Points About an Axis”, a study of the form of distributions found in the arrangement of leaves around their stem (Phyllotaxis). In October of 1871, in Memoirs of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, Wright published a more complete study of this problem entitled “The Uses and Origin of the Arrangement of Leaves in Plants”. Posthumously, and due to the influence of Prof. Asa Gray (a former professor of his of natural history at Harvard College) Wright’s study “A Popular Explanation (for those who understand Botany) of the Mathematical Nature of Phyllotaxis” was published in the American Naturalist (June 1876). Mention of these studies, as well as a wonderful summary for those who are not very familiar with botany or mathematics, are included in a letter dated August 1, 1871 to Charles Darwin, who expressed much interest in Wright’s studies on phyllotaxis (Letters 232-233). In June of the same year, he wrote an article on “The Economy and Symmetry of the Honey-Bee’s cells” for The Mathematical Monthly where he analyses the geometrical properties of the hive-cell, which as excavation and structures share the angles of the plane of 120 degrees, or four-thirds of a right angle to any other. These aforementioned articles conclude Wright’s contributions to The Mathematical Monthly.

In April 1864, Wright reviewed Prof. Chauvenet’s text “A Manual of Spherical and Practical Astronomy” for the North American Review, which he praises as a welcomed text for students in astronomical observation and calculation, replete with a history of the science, adding also praise for Chauvenet’s work on Spherical trigonometry, the problem of Eclipses, Occultations, and the numerical method of dealing with the values of observed quantities. Wright was always conscious of how his desire for precise terms and definitions became strained when, as a mathematician, he found himself out of his element (Letters 67). He left us a remarkable statement on this danger, from a letter to Miss Grace Norton dated January 1874, which is worth quoting in full. “There is ease and ease – two kinds – in understanding [with the degree of precision which analytic habits of thought demand]. Mathematics is easy in one way, - cannot be misunderstood, except by gross carelessness; is no more vague than a boulder; is either out of, or in, the mind entirely. To make progress among a heap of boulders is, you know, far from easy, in one way; but it is easier than walking on water, or than clearing the rough ground by flight. It is easy to dream of making such a flight, and to have every thing else in our dream as rational as real things; and it is easy to be actually carried on the made ways of familiar phraseology over difficulties which we are interested in only as a picturesque under-view, but which do not tempt us to explore them with the chemist’s reagents, the mineralogist’s tests, or the geologist’s hammer” (Letters 254). In this short statement we may gauge Chauncey Wright’s philosophical position, and his main line of critique against metaphysics, theology, and fanciful system building, which strove as was previously mentioned, to “turn[ ] history into mythology, and science into mythic cosmology” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 61).

b. Cosmology as “Cosmic Weather”

Wright’s interest and writings on cosmology are an excellent example of his approach to the problems of philosophical speculation and scientific research. The tension between these areas of study is nowhere clearer than in these writings. From these meditations, Wright coined the metaphor “cosmic weather”, a most apt term to reveal the continual presence of irregularities as product of the causal complexity, mixture of law and accident in the continual production of natural and physical causes unhinged from a teleological framework and continually prone to what he called “counter-movements” – or the action and counter-action and cycles of convertible and reversible mechanical energy. For Wright, “the physical laws of nature are … the only real type of the general order in the universe … showing at every turn the ultimate play of action and counter-action in the balanced forces from which they spring” (Letters 177). These reflections are also revealed in Wright’s conceptual patience and theoretical doubts on issues seemingly complex, for instance, the nature of volitional determinations and human actions which he believed were also product of the law of causation, but more embroiled with metaphors of “good” and “evil,” which raise the level of ambiguity by the increased reliance on metaphorical characters. For Wright “it is easy to be actually carried on the made ways of familiar phraseology over difficulties which we are interested in only as a picturesque under-view, but which do not tempt us to explore them with the chemist’s reagents, the mineralogist’s tests, or the geologist’s hammer” (Letters 254). Wright uses the difficulty of predicting the weather to focus the problem that “we do not hope to predict the weather with certainty, though this is probably a much simpler problem [than those of ethics, metaphysics, and theology]” (Letters 74). For Wright, phenomena, from the simplest organism to the grander phenomena of the universe, find observational repose in the complex connections of the law of evolution (non-teleologically construed), freed from the metaphorical disputes of faith, morality, and metaphysics. For a view of Wright’s position on this, and on the principle of “counter-movements” his article “A Physical Theory of the Universe” in Philosophical Discussions, serves as a prime example. Wright’s position is further clarified in his article “The Genesis of Species”, where he writes, “the very hope of experimental philosophy, its expectation of constructing the science into a true philosophy of nature, is based on the induction, or, if you please, the a priori presumption, that physical causation is universal; that the constitution of nature is written in its actual manifestations, and needs only to be deciphered by experimental and inductive research; that it is not a latent invisible writing, to be brought out by the magic of mental anticipation or metaphysical meditation” (Philosophical Discussions 131). Wright’s use of “weather” was picked up by William James in The Will to Believe (1896), for which his friend C.A. Strong wrote on November 12, 1905, “if external happenings are weather, then internal happenings … are so too, and they maintain themselves not primarily because they are true but because they are useful” (James, Correspondence, 2003: 11).

Contained in Philosophical Discussions there are three major reflections on the issue of cosmology and a true philosophy of nature, “A Physical Theory of the Universe” (July 1864), “Speculative Dynamics” (June 1875), and “A Fragment on Cause and Effect” (1873). In Wright’s uncollected articles, one may also profit from reading “The Winds and the Weather” (The Nation, January 1858), “Ennis on the Origin of the Stars” (The Nation, March, 1867), “The Correlation and Conservation of Gravitation and Heat, and the some of the effect of these Forces on the Solar System” (North American Review, July 1867), and “The Positive Philosophy” (North American Review, January 1868).

From Wright’s earliest piece, “The Winds and the Weather” (1858), an essay-review of three texts, he states that “the study of climates is … the first step towards the solution of the problem of the weather”, yet, he adds “the weather makes the most reckless excursions from its averages…” Weather is nothing but the “perturbations of climate” where one must track the periodic and prevailing winds, a first feature of regularity noticed by Halley as trade-winds, and product of the “unequal distribution of the sun’s heat in different latitudes”. Where Wright’s forward looking view of cosmology enters his review-essay is when he notes the “disturbing [second-order] accidents”, namely, “effects of the distributions themselves upon the action of the disturbing agencies.” As part of the idea of “counter-movements”, Wright believes that “some of the outward changes of nature are regular and periodic, while others without law or method, are apparently adapted by their diversity to draw out the unlimited capacities and varieties of life … as organic nature approaches a regulated confusion, the more it tends to bring forth that perfect order, of which fragments appear in the incomplete system of actual organic life.” In a similar vein, Wright saw the vast expanse of the nebulae and stars, in the “operations of secondary causes” that works with, yet as a check on, the simplistic theory of spiritualistic cosmic evolution most always prefaced by the ever deceptive yet charming metaphor: “In the beginning….”

In “Ennis on the Origin of the Stars” (The Nation, March 1867), Wright questions the facile understanding of the “law of motion” and the misstep of writers in seeking the origin of such laws from the nebular hypothesis and the interaction of its parts; a fault, he believes, of the author’s failure to employ previous accomplishments in the history of science. This is a similar criticism he leveled against Ethan Chapin’s “The Correlation and Conservation of Gravitation and Heat” (North American Review, 1867). This reveals Wright’s belief in the “guidance of results already reached”, which would eliminate the many false moves in “retracing our steps, and remodeling our fundamental ideas”. Upon the path of results already reached, Wright would add that “no one is bound to maintain any hypotheses to the exclusion of any other, until it is proved to be true”, and as part of his principle of “counter-movements” adds that “enlightened faith … does not demand as the condition of assent the force of irresistible demonstration, nor does it deceive itself with fallacious arguments” (“The Positive Philosophy” in North American Review, January 1868). In Wright’s review of Fendler’s “The Mechanism of the Universe and its Primary Effort-exerting Powers” (The Nation, June 1875), we find a more sustained criticism of the abuse of nomenclatures when mathematical definitions are allowed to slide into speculative metaphysics. These processes, as Wright mentions in “A Fragment on Cause and Effect” (1873) are always “causes [as] a continuation of conditions, or a concurrence of things, relations and events.” Throughout his writings on cosmology, Wright maintained a healthy tension with his non-developmental, ateleological view of “counter-movements”. It was no doubt a source of conceptual worry for the builders of philosophical systems of the time, H. Spencer, J. McCosh, F. Bowen, F.E. Abbot, J. Fiske, and C.S. Peirce.

c. Evolution as Theory of Natural Selection

Of all the articles of Chauncey Wright we find the most sustained flow in his reflections on the structure of evolutionary thought, which he saw and defended as Darwin’s theory of natural selection, a theory stripped of any a priori grounds or teleological ends, and as an on-going cumulative use of experiment, observation and argument.

The essay articles that cover Wright’s reflection on evolutionary theory are “Limits of Natural Selection”, “The Genesis of Species”, “Evolution by Natural Selection”, and “Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, all of which are collected in the volume Philosophical Discussions. An earlier article entitled “Natural Theology as a Positive Science” sets the stage for understanding Wright’s elimination of all religious dogmatism from the work of science, especially the latter’s misuse of final causes, ends, and intelligent design, which amount to the “theologian’s perversion of language.” “Evolution by Natural Selection” was a critique of the English Jesuit Naturalist George Mivart (1827-1900), which Wright had sent to Darwin on June 21, 1871, and which Darwin mentions and praises in The Descent of Man, stating that “nothing can be clearer than the way in which you discuss the permanence and fixity of species” (Letters 230-231). The article “Genesis of Species” was so admired by Darwin that he took it upon himself to publish it in England. Darwin wrote, “Will you provisionally give me permission to reprint your article as a pamphlet?” In a following letter Darwin added “I have been looking over your review again; and it seems to me and others so excellent that, if I receive your permission, with a title, I will republish it, notwithstanding that I am afraid pamphlets on literary or scientific subjects never will sell in England” (Letters 231). Together with these studies, Wright also provided us with two brief book notices, one entitled, “Books Relating to the Theory of Evolution” (The Nation, February, 1875), which serves as a primer to the literature surrounding the “unsurpassable quality” of Darwin’s 1872 edition of The Origin of Species. In the words of Wright’s friend James Bradley Thayer, “Darwin was a thinker who fairly drew from [Wright] an unbounded homage; and this lasted till his death; I never heard him speak of any one with such ardor of praise” (Letters 30). Wright met Charles Darwin in London on September 5, 1872 (Letters 246-247), and exchanged many letters with Darwin, the most revealing written on August 29, 1872, September 3, 1874, and February 24, 1875 (Letters 240-246, 304-318, 331-338).

3. Theory of Knowledge

None of Wright’s essays or reviews contains a full account of his theory of knowledge (epistemology). Wright did not generalize on the nature of thinking or on cosmology as generalized evolution. One can see his theory of knowledge as weighing in on the side of an empirical view, one that must be tested towards more precise types of verification, and at all costs avoiding any metaphysical trapping of “origins”. In combining his letters and the mention of the problems of knowledge throughout his published articles, one may gain a picture of his leaning towards empirical verification, that is, where beliefs are continually tested by shared concrete experiences. A primer to Wright’s view of the problems of knowledge and its shifts from ancient to modern science is seen in the first eleven pages of his 1865 article “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” (Philosophical Discussions 43-96). While verification is essential to scientific method, Wright believed that “there is still room for debate as to what constitutes verification in the various departments of philosophical inquiry” (Philosophical Discussions 45). Even as an empiricist, from but not blindly wedded to, the tradition of David Hume, Wright would not settle for an undisputed base of knowledge, but was more convinced that, in shared common experience (working hypotheses), and the study of how other individual perspectives interact, one would be allowed more profitable hypotheses. On this issue of hypotheses one must carefully follow what Wright says in reference to Darwin, that is, that he was “no more a maker of hypotheses than Newton was”, and that hypotheses have “no place in experimental philosophy” (Philosophical Discussions 136). For Wright, hypotheses are “trial questions … interrogations of nature; they are scaffolding which must be taken down as they are succeeded by the tests, the verifications of observation and experiment” (Philosophical Discussions 384).

A fairly detailed view of Wright’s position on the theory of knowledge is seen in his letter to F.E. Abbot, dated Oct 28, 1867 (Letters 123-135), where Wright argues that an “impression is cognized only when brought into consciousness”, and sees consciousness as a process of accumulated, shifting, and comparative laws. In “Limits of Natural Selection” (October, 1870), Wright states, “Matter and mind co-exist. There are no scientific principles by which either can be determined to be the cause of the other.” Consciousness is co-operative memory (or trained imagination), which interacts with the senses and works its laws as “grounds of expectation” (Letters 131). This allows Wright to circumvent both the closed question of the finality of knowledge, and the specter of relativism. While he believed in grounds, he was opposed to asserting and defending them dogmatically. Two important articles that touch on this through the mention of various theories are Wright’s “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” and “McCosh on Tyndall” in Philosophical Discussions 43-96 and 375-384. Wright also focuses on the “form of truth” (Letters 300), where accurate statements lead us to shared and testable accounts of knowledge. Wright mentions Socrates’ attitude, that “there is no merit in any really known truth, however sacred to any one, greater than clearness and adequacy of expression” (Letters 300), for “I wonder whether you get any adequate idea from [an] inadequate sentence” (Letters 270).

Another telling letter on issue and upshots of theories of knowledge is Wright’s letter to Miss Grace Norton dated August 12, 1874. There he writes, “… the human heart is a gallery of the future, illuminated by the light of its instincts and experience reflected from pictures and images of the future and the universal. As the repository and agency of all rationally conceived ends, it is the only rational final cause to itself, however serviceable it may be incidentally to other forms of life or living beings. The uses of other forms of life to the human are not final causes, though the uses of any forms of life to the universe would properly be final, if it were true that the universe is served by them in any other way than to make it up, or be among the threads that are woven in its endless combinations – its formal rather than its final causes” (Letters 292). Along with this telling vision, Wright also warns that “to demand the submission of the intellect to the mystery of the simplest and most elementary relation of cause and effect in phenomena, or the restraint of its inquisitiveness on reaching an ultimate law of nature, is asking too much, in that it is a superfluous demand”, and adds that “explanation cannot go, and does not rationally seek to go, beyond such facts [the connection of elements in phenomena] …” (“The Evolution of Self-Consciousness” in Philosophical Discussions 247).

“The Evolution of Self-Consciousness” (April, 1873) was Wright’s most accomplished study, and one personally prompted by Darwin, and the question of the links and differences in animal instinct and human intelligence. Wright called this field of study “pyschozoology”, where he set out to show how there was “no act of self-consciousness, however elementary [that] may have realized before man’s first self-conscious act in the animal world …” (Philosophical Discussions 200). In this study Wright was clearly opposed to any mysticism in theory or religious application, seeing how it leads to vagueness, and teleological assumptions. He instead focused on the difference in degree between the stimulus and use of signs in physical and phenomenal experience, a direct application of Darwin’s stimulus-response conception. Wright saw the desire to communicate in both animal and humans; though by degree, the animal’s activity grasps the “signs” without knowledge of the sign as a sign, thus relying on “outward attention” as the main support of its common-sense nature. Humans form “reflective attention”, that is, signs that are recognized and related to what they signify, both in past use and as projected future use. This is possible when signs are recognized and manipulated through memory able to distinguish between outward and inward signs, thus as “representative imaginations of objects and their relations [kinds]” (Philosophical Discussions 208). It is through this double attentiveness that the “germ of the distinctive human form of self-consciousness” was planted (Philosophical Discussions 210).

4. History of Philosophy

Wright was by no means a historian of philosophy in the tradition of those influenced and trained in Germany, as seen years later in the Harvard professor Josiah Royce (1855-1916). However, as a catalyst for the “Cambridge Septum Club” and the “Metaphysical Club” there were ample occasions throughout the meetings to mention figures and theories that pertained to the history of philosophy. As early as 1857, C. S. Peirce recalls how he would debate philosophy almost daily with Wright, and most regularly on the work of Mill (Menand 2001, 221, 477n.42). From what we have in Wright’s letters, figures from the history of philosophy were mostly focused upon a desire to point out, question, or resolve a conceptual problem or misgiving, rather than spin a narrative of historical schools and conceptual debts. As a case in point, and to show how Wright maintained a similar position throughout the areas of intellectual interest, it is worth pointing out that Wright, using a term in David Masson’s “Recent British Philosophy”, which he reviewed in 1866, believed that “the ontological passion” is “very nearly akin to what, in the modern sense of the word, is expressed by ‘dogmatism’ [which when coupled with] his [Masson’s] scheme of classification … discovers the relations between opinions of [the] philosophers [in question]” (Philosophical Discussions 344). It is clear that Wright would see any history of philosophy as a drive to classify prone to a motive of justification. The unfolding of the history of philosophy in itself was not a necessary technique for Wright, mostly due to his non-academic employment, yet also by the nature of his wide scope of interests, of which philosophy proper was but another tool and set of problems. One possible reason for this critical position and avoidance of such “histories” is that, for him, “the mythic instinct slips into the place of chronicles at every opportunity,” so much so that he claims, “all history is written on dramatic principle” (Philosophical Discussions 70-71). Wright was not prone to enchantment over explanation, and thus not susceptible to a philosophy of history as an inexorable philosophical progression. Yet, through his letters and the Philosophical Discussions, and in uncollected publications, he did mention many figures that make up a telling configuration of philosophers. As part of the configuration we find a portion of a reading list and Wright’s favorites beginning with Emerson, who he also heard lecture on the poets at Harvard, then Sir Henry Maine’s Ancient Law, Bacon’s Novum Organum, Whewell’s History of the Inductive Science, List’s, Political Economy, Hamilton’s Lectures on Metaphysics, Lectures on Logic, and Philosophy of the Conditioned, Mill’s Logic, and Examination of Sir William Hamilton, Alexander Bain, (on which Wright based his lectures on psychology at Harvard) and of course Darwin’s Origin of Species and the Descent of Man. Among the philosophers mentioned in his Letters, not including Wright’s contemporaries, one finds, Bacon, Bain, Fichte, Hamilton, Hegel, Kant, J.S. Mill, Occam, Plato, and by far with the most mentions, Socrates. With the addition of Aristotle, Locke, and Zeno, the mentions are fairly similar in his Philosophical Discussions.

The following citation could be read as Wright’s caution in approaching the history of philosophy as a meta-narrative, and as a critique of the undertow of a Hegelian brand of mythic history. “All cosmological speculations are strictly teleological. We never can comprehend the whole of a concrete series of events. What arrests our attention in it is what constitutes the parts of an order either real or dramatic, or are determined by interests which are spontaneous in human life. Our speculations about what we have not really observed, to which we supply order and most of the facts, are necessarily determined by some principle of order in our minds. Now the most general principle which we can have is this: that the concrete series shall be an intelligible series in its entirety; thus alone can it interest and attract our thoughts and arouse rational curiosity” (“The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” in Philosophical Discussions 71). Wright’s sharpest critique of the metaphysical pretensions of order can be seen in his essay “German Darwinism” (September 9, 1875 in Philosophical Discussions 398-405).

It is likely that the most discussed critical position of Wright on the history of philosophy would have been a study not only of concepts and methods, but also motives. “The questions of philosophy proper are human desires and fears and aspirations – human emotions – taking an intellectual form” (Philosophical Discussions 50). This reveals Wright’s more sociological and psychological interest in the conditions for the pursuit of certain theories and methods over others. “We do not”, he wrote, “inquire what course has led to successful answers in science, but what motives have prompted the pertinent questions” (Philosophical Discussions 48). Further he adds, “philosophy proper should be classed with the Religions and with the Fine Arts, and estimated rather by the dignity of its motives, and the value it directs us to, than by the value of its own attainment” (Philosophical Discussions 52). This is again clearly stated in Wright’s review-essay “Lewes’s Problems of Life and Mind” in Philosophical Discussions, pages 366-368, where he mentions issues with “method” from Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Bacon, Leibniz, Locke and Newton. What Wright shows us is that “those who take the most active part in the philosophical discussions of their day have enlisted early in life in one or the other of two great schools [Platonic or Aristotelian], inspired predominately by one or the other of two distinct sets of philosophical motives, which we may characterize briefly as motives of defense in questioned sentiments, and motives of scientific or utilitarian inquisitiveness” (Philosophical Discussions 367).

For Wright, a history of philosophy would be an exacting engagement in discussion seeking to make the study of other minds part of the particular goods of human life, and as such would need to study how “philosophical stand-points” are but a parallax of previous doctrines (see Letters 124). Such a discursive history of philosophy (perhaps even “dialogical”) would require a “clearness and adequacy of expression” (Letters 300).

5. Pedagogy and the Philosophy of Education

Chauncey Wright’s “The Conflict of Studies” is a long review article of Isaac Todhunter’s (1820-1884) The Conflict of Studies, and Other Essays on Subjects connected with Education (1873). Todhunter was a mathematical lecturer at St. John’s College, Cambridge. The review appeared in The North American Review, July 1875, and is collected in Philosophical Discussions. Wright’s review was part of the ongoing debate on American educational reform during the mid-nineteenth century. Wright was privy to some of these changes, first as a student of Harvard College from 1848 to 1852, and then in 1870-1871 and 1874-1875 of Harvard’s early experiments in invited professional lecturers, under its then president and advocate of the Elective system, Charles W. Eliot.

Isaac Todhunter’s essay “The Conflict of Studies” notes the call for “useful knowledge” current in higher education, framing it as diffusion for and among the “humbler classes” (Todhunter 1873, 1). Todhunter, a conservative in the eyes of Wright, belongs to the line of Oxford and Cambridge masters who looked upon the growth of useful knowledge and the experimental sciences as inferior to what was taught at the ‘wealthy college or university”. Todhunter saw this difference reflected in the structures and rigor of competitive examinations, remarking that “we must not expect boys from the humbler classes to excel in the more expensive luxuries of education” (Todhunter, 1873, 21). Together with his marginalizing of the new experimental sciences, his dislike of the inclusion of any practical focus on the success or influence of mathematical study in practical life, and his disbelief in the powers of natural history or natural philosophy in raising a student’s attention to related pursuits, Todhunter stands in an opposite camp from Chauncey Wright. Wright responds to this with an insightful characterization of a letter of a young Union officer. “Command of the lower memory is doubtless improved by the mastery of some one or two subjects; the more special and narrow they are, the better, perhaps, for saving time, and even if they do not belong to what is commonly accounted essential to a liberal education. […] A young officer of the Union army in our late struggle, in a letter written on the evening before the battle in which his life was sacrificed, attributed his previous successes, and rapid promotion to responsible duties, to a six months’ study of turtles at the Zoölogical Museum of Harvard University, which was undertaken merely from the youthful instinct of mastery, or appreciation of the value of discipline, and was interrupted by the breaking out of the war and the young man’s enlistment in the service. Perhaps, however, the independence of character which determined this choice of means for discipline was the real source of the success which the youth too modestly attributed to the discipline itself” (Philosophical Discussions, 294).

The conflict of studies can be understood not only as the contrast between old curriculum and the more modern elective studies, but more profoundly as the conflict of the employment of types of memory, which Wright is clear in pointing out. “Writing and artificial memory are often, I think, in the way of a better sort of memory which holds what is worth retaining by more real ties” (Letters 201).

Wright unfolds what he considers to be aspects of a liberal education, and how a philosophy of mathematics can be re-employed towards a reform of general liberal education. The areas would be: i) the perfection of symbolism, ii) the use (applicability) of notation (symbols) to other sciences, iii) usefulness as the “objective ulterior value” of modern mathematics, and iv) where “useful knowledge” is that which is free from the mimicry of facts (cramming) and instead, focused on the moment of ‘selection” or the “utility of non-utilitarian motives.” For Wright, always cautious of his definitions, cramming is “a given amount of studious attention, either rational or merely mnemonic, given to a subject exclusively and for a short time” and this “gives the mind a different and a less persistent or valuable hold on the subject than the same amount and kind of attention spread over a longer time and interrupted by other pursuits” (Philosophical Discussions, 288). The focus on “selection” spread over a longer period of time, combines Wright’s evolutionary studies with the vision of keeping philosophy alive as the love of study, and as a “guest” not an “inmate” of the corporate spirit of the university or the “pittances of schoolmasters.”

Wright suggests a healthy dose of repetition, understood as a second mode of memory which would entail: i) the repeated acts of direct attention, (as repetition and intensity of impressions), ii) the repeated recalls or recollection, which has the variety of association, and repeated acts of voluntary recollection, or the active exercise of memory. This last mode needs “interposed intervals and diversions of attention,” which strengthen the more far-reaching constructive associations of thought (essential/rational), allowing the growth of reason. Such an understanding of the growth of reason and the re-tooling of the use of memory is directed against Todhunter’s idea that students should not question the statements of tutors, which for Wright entails shying away from appreciating evidence and learning from how experiments might also fail. Todhunter’s antiseptic vision of examinable experiments, where failure is seen as a static component, runs counter to the manifold processes involved in the love of study championed by Wright. “I venture to volunteer the advice that, in teaching philosophy, it is well to call in question and refute every thing you can, with the aid of collateral reading, in order that the young [students] may never forget that they are not studying their catechisms,--not merely studying to acquire true and settled doctrines, but mainly to strengthen their understanding, to learn to think, and doubt, and inquire with equanimity” (Letters 120).

Wright champions the “far-reaching constructive association of thought” (retentive memory), not as Todhunter believed, simple memory as exercised and practiced in the repetition of examinations as “temporary associations” (or recollection). The lower order of simple memory is not conducive to what Wright saw as the complex ends of study, that is, the “satisfaction of thought itself as a mental exercise.” What Wright grants as a testing of memory in conjunction with intuition, is raised by his example of the child’s memory of stories via contiguity and consecutiveness (retentiveness), versus a student’s memory for isolated facts in comparative mythology (recollection).

Wright suggests that the student be freed from the mere exercise of “simple memory” (or simple faith) by working with the “direct effect of illustrations … to aid the understanding and imagination,” which as part of the “ladder of the intellect” is made of the movement and counter-movements from the general to the particular, the abstract to the concrete and “to return again” (which includes the particular seen in the stages of experimental practices). “Only enough of discipline in the actual practice of experiments to enable the student to study his text-book intelligibly seems to us desirable for the purposes of a general education” (Philosophical Discussions 276).

Part of what this experimental practice entails is the use of what is recreational, that is, the fondness or love of study construed by a play-impulse. This is firmly opposed in Todhunter’s position. Instead, Wright (in Darwinian fashion) sees the aspect of the recreational (or re-associative) as what will have “habit to secure attractiveness,” where play is a useful character, or drive that overcomes the repetitive and droll “irksome exercises” (Letters 201).

The larger arena of debate, as Wright saw it, centered on the University’s duties to “mankind or to their several nations,” which entailed five related problems. The first is whether higher general university education should take on the form of a simple curriculum, or a variety of courses. The next problem must address the question of what constitutes a liberal education, which in turn will prompt the problem of the ends of a liberal education, which will lead to the fourth problem, that is, how these ends are to translate through a general education or specific studies found in lower school training. Wright’s perspective becomes clear in questioning the rather simplistic use of “ends,” geared, as he saw it, more by the “customs and institutions” within which the writers of reform (and the conservatives) are caught. Wright suggests that the problem of manifold ends requires a “scientific analysis of the experience,” which is a very sociological view. “It is quite true that the great qualities required and developed in philosophers by original research in experimental sciences are not product, or even approached, by the repetition of their experiments … Nevertheless we attribute much more value to a first-hand acquaintance with experimental processes than [Todhunter] appears to do. [Even] failures have in them an important general lesson, especially useful in correcting impressions and mental habits formed by too exclusive attention to abstract studies …” (Philosophical Discussions 274).

6. Recollections, Influence, and Critical Reception

A notice in the Hampshire Gazette, dated October 5, 1875, honoring Wright, mentions how his teacher at the Select High School from Northampton, Prof. David S. Sheldon “kindly and successfully suppressed [Wright’s rather deplorable early literary-poetic essays] and so it seems turned a very bad poet into a very great philosopher.” In Wright’s Letters J.B. Thayer, a classmate at Northampton High School shares what was reported in the notice, by yet another classmate, which describes how Prof. Sheldon “led all his pupils out into the fields and woods and taught them to observe the facts of nature, the life of plants and habits of birds, and insect, the movements of the heavenly bodies, the phenomena of the clouds …” Wright remembered this fondly, and in his Harvard College class-book of 1858 wrote of his inspired and zealous teacher and the specimens collected on these excursion through the wilds of Northampton. Though the collection has been lost, Wright retained the care and detail for these observations from Nature, especially seen in his letter to the daughter of Mr. Norton, Sara, dated September 1, 1875, eleven days before he died (Letters 353-354).

Wright was remembered with great affection by each of his friends, due to his good nature and talent for Socratic dialogue. Through the Letters this quality comes alive. A perceptive description of Wright’s person and style is found in John Fiske’s essay “Chauncey Wright” (Ryan 2000:3). Fiske writes, “his essays and review-article were pregnant with valuable suggestions, which he was wont to emphasize so slightly that their significance might easily pass unheeded; and such subtle suggestions made so large a part of his philosophical style that, if any of them chanced to be overlooked by the reader, the point and bearing of the entire argument was liable to be misapprehended.” Further he adds, “there was something almost touching in the endless patience with which he would strive in conversation to make abstruse matters clear to ordinary minds … [and] one of the most marked features of Mr. Wright’s style of thinking was his insuperable aversion to all forms of teleology … [and] more often he called himself a Lucretian [and] sharply attacked Anaxagoras for introducing creative design into the universe in order to bring coherence out of chaos. What need, he argued, to imagine a supernatural agency in order to get rid of primeval chaos, when we have no reason to believe that the primeval chaos ever had an existence save as a figment of the metaphysician!” In conclusion, Fiske wrote that “to have known such a man is an experience one cannot forget or outlive. To have had him pass away, leaving so scanty a record of what he had it in him to utter, is nothing less than a public calamity” (Ryan 2000:3, pp. 5-19).

William James also contributed a piece in The Nation upon Wright’s death, where he wrote that “Mr. Wright belonged to the precious band of genuine philosophers, and among them few can have been as completely disinterested as he. Add to this eminence his tireless amiability, his beautiful modesty, his affectionate nature and freedom from egotism, his childlike simplicity in worldly affairs, and we have the picture of a character of which his friends feel more than ever now the elevation and purity” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 4). Yet there was one mostly negative response to Wright from Borden Parker Bowne (1847-1910) written a few years after Wright’s death. It mostly defends his position against which Wright was critical, and seeking to place Wright in the camp of a crude empiricist. The article is of interest due to the effort to mention the history of philosophy with which Wright was engaged, and for which Prof. Bowne chides him for being anachronistic, lacking and narrow in historical study, and accuses him of being a mere critic, not a system-builder. If one adds to this Wright’s ateleological predisposition, his view of the belief in a God as confession of one’s speculative convictions and productions of education and experience, and in the possibility of irreligious morality, we gain part of the view of why his works were also difficult to place in the then budding neo-Hegelian religious system-builder of Classical American philosophy.

As the catalyst of the “Cambridge Septum Club” (1856, 1858, 1859), and especially for the “Metaphysical Club” (1872), Chauncey Wright was, as C.S. Peirce put it, the “intellectual boxing master”. As William James stated, Wright’s best work was “done in conversation; and in the acts and writing of the many friends he influenced, his spirit will, in one way or another, as the years roll on, be more operative than it ever was in direct production” (James in Ryan 2000: 1-2). As part of a splendid recollection of Wright as a modest, simple and well disposed friend, and as a “philosopher of the antique or Socratic type”, James’ tribute captures what Wright’s presence must have inspired. Where the perceptive and enthusiastic James overstated is in how Wright’s “acts and writing” would “be more operative than it ever was in direct production”. Apart from the few direct mentions in the works of William James in The Principles of Psychology (Preface), The Will to Believe, in Pragmatism, and once in his Letters, Wright was not made part of the emerging philosophical renaissance at Harvard.

There is a similarity in the immediate fate of Wright’s works, and those of C.S. Peirce, though the works and subsequent influence of Peirce in American philosophy was saved from oblivion thanks to the generosity of James and the care and philosophical and historical sensibility of Royce. The legacy of the works of Wright is owed to his friends J.B. Thayer, who collected his letters, and privately printed the volume in 1877, and his friend C. E. Norton, who collected his principle writings under the title Philosophical Discussions (1877). Yet, thirty-six review-articles remain in the journals within which Wright had published, from the years 1858 to 1876.

In a letter to William James, dated November 21, 1875, C.S. Peirce stated that “as to [Wright] being obscure and all that, he was as well known as a philosopher need desire. It is only when a philosopher has something very elementary to say that he seeks the great public or the great public him.” Peirce then adds, “I wish I was in Cambridge for one thing. I should like to have some talks about Wright and his ideas and see if we couldn’t get up a memorial for him. His memory deserves it for he did a great deal for every one of us [James, Peirce, Abbot]. Other of his friends, Gurney, Norton, Peter Lesley, Asa Gray etc., would be wanted to do the personal and other relations. But what I am thinking of [I don’t purpose anything] is to give some resume of his ideas and of the history of his thought” (James, The Correspondence of William James, Vol. 4. 1995: 523-524). These talks never happened.

While both Peirce and James acknowledged their personal debt to their “intellectual boxing master”, apart from a few mentions in their letters and in a few of James’ works, no directly cited conceptual links can be traced with scholarly confidence. While Charles Darwin was impressed by Wright’s work, and saw him as one of his clearest readers, the untimely death of Wright ended what could have been a more productive exchange. In Wright’s letters one finds that he possibly influenced Nicholas St. John Green in discussing the use of the terms “duty of belief”, (though reference to the author is not provided by Thayer). Wright believed that “duty of belief” means only those principles of conduct, and what follows from them, which recommend themselves to all rational beings or at least to all adult rational, human beings (Letters 342-343). One can imagine William James being present, and then adopting this critique years later for his text, The Will to Believe (1896). It was Nicholas St. John Green, as Max Fisch reports, that “urged the importance of applying Alexander Bain’s definition of belief as that upon which a man is prepared to act”, and continues, “from this definition, Peirce adds, pragmatism is scare more than a corollary” (Ryan 2000: 99, and 99n.28; 136). If C.S. Peirce was “disposed to think of [Bain] as the grandfather of pragmatism” (and either himself, or St. John Green as fathers), then perhaps, one may again refer to Chauncey Wright as pragmatism’s “uncle”, because Wright, more than anyone of his early fellow thinkers, worked under the guidance of the “instinctive attraction for living facts”, as Peirce once defined pragmatism (Ryan 2000: 136, 139).

7. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Wright, Chauncey, 1850-1875. Chauncey Wright Papers, American Philosophical Society.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1858. “The Winds and the Weather.” Atlantic Monthly Vol. 1 (January): pp. 272-279.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1971.Philosophical Discussions, ed. Charles Eliot Norton, (Henry Holt and Co., 1877), New York: Burt Franklin.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1971a. Letters of Chauncey Wright, ed. James Bradley Thayer, (Cambridge 1878), New York: Burt Franklin.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, Katharine, 2005. Predicting the Weather: Victorians and the Science of Meteorology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Chambliss, J.J., 1960. “Natural Selection and Utilitarian Ethics in Chauncey Wright”, American Quarterly, 12, pp. 145-152.
  • Chambliss, J.J., 1964. “Chauncey Wright’s Enduring Naturalism”, American Quarterly, 16, pp. 628-635.
  • Clendenning, John, 1985. The Life and Thought of Josiah Royce, Wisconsin: The University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cohen, Felix, S. 1962. American Thought: A Critical Sketch. New York: Collier Books.
  • Croce, P. J., 1998. Science and Religion in the Era of William James: Eclipse of Certainty, 1820-1880,
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1909. Education for Efficiency and The New Definition of the Cultivated Man, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1913.The Tendency to the Concrete and Practical in Modern Education, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1924.Late Harvest: Miscellaneous Papers Written between Eighty and Ninety, Boston: The Atlantic Monthly Press.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1969.Educational Reform, New York: Arno Press.
  • Fisch, M.H., 1942. “Justice Holmes, the Prediction Theory of Law and Pragmatism”, The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 39, No. 4 (February 12), pp. 85-97.
  • Fiske, John, 1902. “Chauncey Wright” in Darwanism and Other Essays, Boston: Houghton, Mifflin andCompany.
  • Flower, Elizabeth, and Murphey, Murray, G., 1977, A History of Philosophy in America, Vol 2. New York: G.P. Putnam’s Sons.
  • Gardiner, John H., 1914. Harvard, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Giuffrida, Robert Jr., 1980. “Chauncey Wright and the Problem of Relations,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 16, No. 4 (Fall): pp. 293-308.
  • Giuffrida, Robert Jr., 1988. “The Philosophical Thought of Chauncey Wright: Edward Madden’s Contribution to Wright Scholarship,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 24, No. 1, (Winter): pp. 37-43.
  • Hawkins, Hugh, 1972. Between Harvard and America: The Educational Leadership of Charles W. Eliot, NewYork: Oxford University Press.
  • Hill, George B., 1895. Harvard College by an Oxonian, New York: Macmillan and Co.
  • Huler, Scott, 2004. Defining the Wind: The Beaufort Scale, and How a Nineteenth-Century Admiral Turned Science into Poetry, New York: Crown Publishers.
  • James. Henry, 1930. Charles W. Eliot: President of Harvard University 1869-1909, Vols. 1 and 2, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • James, William, 1952. Principles of Psychology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • James, William, 1975. Pragmatism, and The Meaning of Truth, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • James, William, 1992, 1995, 1999, 2000, 2003. The Correspondence of William James, Vols. 1, 4, 7, 8, 11, Edited by Ignas K. Skrupskelis and Elizabeth M. Berkeley, Charlottesville: University of Virginia Press.
  • Kuklick, Bruce, 1977. The Rise of American Philosophy: Cambridge, Massachusetts 1860-1930, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Kuklick, Bruce, 2001. A History of Philosophy in America 1720-2000, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lowell, A. Lawrence, 1962. At War with Academic Traditions in America, Westport, Connecticut: Greenwood Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1955. “The Cambridge Septem,” Harvard Alumni Bulletin, LVII, (January): 310-315.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1958.The Philosophical Writings of Chauncey Wright: Representative Selections, New York: The Liberal Arts Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1963.Chauncey Wright and the Foundations of Pragmatism, Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1972. “Chauncey Wright and the Concept of the Given,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 8, No. 1 (Winter): 48-52.
  • Madden, Edward H., 2000.Introduction, Influence and Legacy, Vol.3 The Evolutionary Philosophy of Chauncey Wright, Frank X. Ryan, (ed.) London: Thoemmes Press.
  • Menand, Louis, 2001. The Metaphysical Club: A Story of Ideas in America, New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux.
  • Morison, Samuel E., 1937. Three Centuries of Harvard (1636-1936), Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Perry, Ralph B., 1935. The Thought and Character of William James, Boston: Little Brown and Company.
  • Privitello, Lucio A., 2005. “Introducing the Philosophy of Education and Pedagogy of Chauncey Wright,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 41, No. 3 (Summer): 627-649.
  • Ryan, Frank X. (ed.), 2000. The Evolutionary Philosophy of Chauncey Wright, 3 vols. London: Thoemmes Press.
  • Santayana, George, 1944. Persons and Places, New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons.
  • Schneider, Herbert W., 1946. A History of American Philosophy, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Sini, Carlo, 1972. Il Pragmatismo Americano, Bari: Editori Laterza.
  • Thelin, John, R. 2004. A History of American Higher Education, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Todhunter, Isaac, 1873. The Conflict of Studies and Other Essays on Subjects connected with Education, London: Macmillian and Co.
  • White, Morton, 1972. Science and Sentiment in America: Philosophical Thought from Jonathan Edwards to John Dewey, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Wiener, Philip P. 1948, “The Pragmatic Legal Philosophy of N. St. John Green (1830-76)”, Journal of the History of Ideas, Vol. 9, No. 1, pp. 70-92.

Author Information

Lucio Angelo Privitello
Email: privitel@stockton.edu
Richard Stockton College of New Jersey

Pragmatism

Pragmatism is a philosophical movement that includes those who claim that an ideology or proposition is true if it works satisfactorily, that the meaning of a proposition is to be found in the practical consequences of accepting it, and that unpractical ideas are to be rejected. Pragmatism originated in the United States during the latter quarter of the nineteenth century. Although it has significantly influenced non-philosophers—notably in the fields of law, education, politics, sociology, psychology, and literary criticism—this article deals with it only as a movement within philosophy.

The term “pragmatism” was first used in print to designate a philosophical outlook about a century ago when William James (1842-1910) pressed the word into service during an 1898 address entitled “Philosophical Conceptions and Practical Results,” delivered at the University of California (Berkeley). James scrupulously swore, however, that the term had been coined almost three decades earlier by his compatriot and friend C. S. Peirce (1839-1914). (Peirce, eager to distinguish his doctrines from the views promulgated by James, later relabeled his own position “pragmaticism”—a name, he said, “ugly enough to be safe from kidnappers.”) The third major figure in the classical pragmatist pantheon is  John Dewey (1859-1952), whose wide-ranging writings had considerable impact on American intellectual life for a half-century. After Dewey, however, pragmatism lost much of its momentum.

There has been a recent resurgence of interest in pragmatism, with several high-profile philosophers exploring and selectively appropriating themes and ideas embedded in the rich tradition of Peirce, James, and Dewey. While the best-known and most controversial of these so-called “neo-pragmatists” is Richard Rorty, the following contemporary philosophers are often considered to be pragmatists: Hilary Putnam, Nicholas Rescher, Jürgen Habermas, Susan Haack, Robert Brandom, and Cornel West.

The article's first section contains an outline of the history of pragmatism; the second, a selective survey of themes and theses of the pragmatists.

Table of Contents

  1. A Pragmatist Who's Who: An Historical Overview
    1. Classical Pragmatism: From Peirce to Dewey
    2. Post-Deweyan Pragmatism: From Quine to Rorty
  2. Some Pragmatist Themes and Theses
    1. A Method and A Maxim
    2. Anti-Cartesianism
    3. The Kantian Inheritance
    4. Against the Spectator Theory of Knowledge
    5. Beyond The Correspondence Theory of Truth
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. A Pragmatist Who's Who: An Historical Overview

a. Classical Pragmatism: From Peirce to Dewey

In the beginning was “The Metaphysical Club,” a group of a dozen Harvard-educated men who met for informal philosophical discussions during the early 1870s in Cambridge, Massachusetts. Club members included proto-positivist Chauncey Wright (1830-1875), future Supreme Court Justice Oliver Wendell Holmes (1841-1935), and two then-fledgling philosophers who went on to become the first self-conscious pragmatists: Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914), a logician, mathematician, and scientist; and William James (1842-1910), a psychologist and moralist armed with a medical degree.

Peirce summarized his own contributions to the Metaphysical Club's meetings in two articles now regarded as founding documents of pragmatism: “The Fixation of Belief” (1877) and “How To Make Our Ideas Clear” (1878). James followed Peirce with his first philosophical essay, “Remarks on Spencer's Definition of Mind as Correspondence,” (1878). After the appearance of The Principles of Psychology (1890), James went on to publish The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy (1896), The Varieties of Religious Experience (1902), Pragmatism: A New Name for Some Old Ways of Thinking (1907), and The Meaning of Truth: A Sequel to Pragmatism (1909). Peirce, unfortunately, never managed to publish a magnum opus in which his nuanced philosophical views were systematically expounded. Still, publish he did, though he left behind a mountain of manuscript fragments, many of which only made it into print decades after his death.

Peirce and James traveled different paths, philosophically as well as professionally. James, less rigorous but more concrete, became an esteemed public figure (and a Harvard professor) thanks to his intellectual range, his broad sympathies, and his Emersonian genius for edifying popularization. He recognized Peirce's enormous creative gifts and did what he could to advance his friend professionally; but ultimately to no avail. Professional success within academe eluded Peirce; after his scandal-shrouded dismissal from Johns Hopkins University (1879-1884)—his sole academic appointment—he toiled in isolation in rural Pennsylvania. True, Peirce was not entirely cut off: he corresponded with colleagues, reviewed books, and delivered the odd invited lecture. Nevertheless, his philosophical work grew increasingly in-grown, and remained largely unappreciated by his contemporaries. The well-connected James, in contrast, regularly derived inspiration and stimulation from a motley assortment of fellow-travellers, sympathizers, and acute critics. These included members of the Chicago school of pragmatists, led by John Dewey (of whom more anon); Oxford's acerbic iconoclast F.C.S. Schiller (1864-1937), a self-described Protagorean and “humanist”; Giovanni Papini (1881-1956), leader of a cell of Italian pragmatists; and two of James’s younger Harvard colleagues, the absolute idealist Josiah Royce (1855-1916) and the poetic naturalist George Santayana (1864-1952), both of whom challenged pragmatism while being influenced by it. (It should be noted, however, that Royce was also significantly influenced by Peirce.)

The final member of the classical pragmatist triumvirate is John Dewey (1859-1952), who had been a graduate student at Johns Hopkins during Peirce's brief tenure there. In an illustrious career spanning seven decades, Dewey did much to make pragmatism (or “instrumentalism,” as he called it) respectable among professional philosophers. Peirce had been persona non grata in the academic world; James, an insider but no pedant, abhorred “the PhD Octopus” and penned eloquent lay sermons; but Dewey was a professor who wrote philosophy as professors were supposed to do—namely, for other professors. His mature works—Reconstruction in Philosophy (1920), Experience and Nature (1925), and The Quest for Certainty (1929)—boldly deconstruct the dualisms and dichotomies which, in one guise or another, had underwritten philosophy since the Greeks. According to Dewey, once philosophers give up these time-honoured distinctions—between appearance and reality, theory and practice, knowledge and action, fact and value—they will see through the ill-posed problems of traditional epistemology and metaphysics. Instead of trying to survey the world sub specie aeternitatis, Deweyan philosophers are content to keep their feet planted on terra firma and address “the problems of men.”

Dewey emerged as a major figure during his decade at the University of Chicago, where fellow pragmatist G.H. Mead (1863-1931) was a colleague and collaborator. After leaving Chicago for Columbia University in 1904, Dewey became even more prolific and influential; as a result, pragmatism became an important feature of the philosophical landscape at home and abroad. Dewey, indeed, had disciples and imitators aplenty; what he lacked was a bona fide successor—someone, that is, who could stand to Dewey as he himself stood to James and Peirce. It is therefore not surprising that by the 1940s—shortly after the publication of Dewey's Logic: The Theory of Inquiry (1938)—pragmatism had lost much of its momentum and prestige.

This is not to say that pragmatists became an extinct species; C. I. Lewis (1883-1964) and Sidney Hook (1902-1989), for instance, remained prominent and productive. But to many it must have seemed that there was no longer much point in calling oneself a pragmatist—especially with the arrival of that self-consciously rigorous import, analytic philosophy. As American philosophers read more and more of Moore, Russell, Wittgenstein, and the Vienna Circle, many of them found the once-provocative dicta of Dewey and James infuriatingly vague and hazy. The age of grand synoptic philosophizing was drawing rapidly to a close; the age of piecemeal problem-solving and hard-edged argument was getting underway.

b. Post-Deweyan Pragmatism: From Quine to Rorty

And so it was that Deweyans were undone by the very force that had sustained them, namely, the progressive professionalization of philosophy as a specialized academic discipline. Pragmatism, once touted as America’s distinctive gift to Western philosophy, was soon unjustly derided by many rank-and-file analysts as passé. Of the original pragmatist triumvirate, Peirce fared the best by far; indeed, some analytic philosophers were so impressed by his technical contributions to logic and the philosophy of science that they paid him the (dubious) compliment of re-making him in their own image. But the reputations of James and Dewey suffered greatly and the influence of pragmatism as a faction waned. True, W.V.O. Quine´s (1908-2000) landmark article “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (1951) challenged positivist orthodoxy by drawing on the legacy of pragmatism. However, despite Quine's qualified enthusiasm for parts of that legacy—an enthusiasm shared in varying degrees by Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889-1951), Rudolf Carnap (1891-1970), Hans Reichenbach (1891-1953), Karl Popper (1902-1994), F.P. Ramsey (1903-1930), Nelson Goodman (1906-1999), Wilfrid Sellars (1912-1989), and Thomas Kuhn (1922-1996)—mainstream analytic philosophers tended to ignore pragmatism until the early 1980s.

What got philosophers talking about pragmatism again was the publication of Richard Rorty's Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979)—a controversial tome which repudiated the basic presuppositions of modern philosophy with élan, verve, and learning. Declaring epistemology a lost cause, Rorty found inspiration and encouragement in Dewey; for Dewey, Rorty pleaded, had presciently seen that philosophy must become much less Platonist and less Kantian—less concerned, that is, with unearthing necessary and ahistorical normative foundations for our culture’s practices. Once we understand our culture not as a static edifice but as an on-going conversation, the philosopher’s official job description changes from foundation-layer to interpreter. In the absence of an Archimedean point, philosophy can only explore our practices and vocabularies from within; it can neither ground them on something external nor assess them for representational accuracy. Post-epistemological philosophy accordingly becomes the art of understanding; it explores the ways in which those voices which constitute that mutable conversation we call our culture—the voices of science, art, morality, religion, and the like—are related.

In subsequent writings—Consequences of Pragmatism (1982), Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity (1989), Achieving Our Country (1998), Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), and three volumes of Philosophical Papers (1991, 1991, 1998)—Rorty has enthusiastically identified himself as a pragmatist; in addition, he has urged that this epithet can be usefully bestowed on a host of other well-known philosophers—notably Donald Davidson (1917-2003). Though Rorty is the most visible and vocal contemporary champion of pragmatism, many other well-known figures have contributed significantly to the resurgence of this many-sided movement. Prominent revivalists include Karl-Otto Apel (b. 1922), Israel Scheffler (b. 1923), Joseph Margolis (b. 1924), Hilary Putnam (b. 1926), Nicholas Rescher (b. 1928), Jürgen Habermas (b. 1929), Richard Bernstein (b. 1932), Stephen Stich (b. 1944), Susan Haack (b. 1945), Robert Brandom (b. 1950), Cornel West (b. 1953), and Cheryl Misak (b. 1961). There is much disagreement among these writers, however, so it would be grossly misleading to present them as manifesto-signing members of a single sect or clique.

2. Some Pragmatist Themes and Theses

What makes these philosophers pragmatists? There is, alas, no simple answer to this question. For there is no pragmatist creed; that is, no neat list of articles or essential tenets endorsed by all pragmatists and only by pragmatists. Nevertheless, it is possible to identify certain ideas that have loomed large in the pragmatist tradition—though that is not to say that these ideas are the exclusive property of pragmatists, nor that they are endorsed by all pragmatists.

Here, then, are some themes and theses to which many pragmatists have been attached.

a. A Method and A Maxim

Pragmatism may be presented as a way of clarifying (and in some cases dissolving) intractable metaphysical and epistemological disputes. According to the down-to-earth pragmatist, bickering metaphysicians should get in the habit of posing the following question: “What concrete practical difference would it make if my theory were true and its rival(s) false?” Where there is no such difference, there is no genuine (that is, non-verbal) disagreement, and hence no genuine problem.

This method is closely connected to the so-called “pragmatic maxim,” different versions of which were formulated by Peirce and James in their attempts to clarify the meaning of abstract concepts or ideas. This maxim points to a broadly verificationist conception of linguistic meaning according to which no sense can be made of the idea that there are facts which are unknowable in principle (that is, truths which no one could ever be warranted in asserting and which could have absolutely no bearing on our conduct or experience). From this point of view, talk of inaccessible Kantian things-in-themselves—of a “True World” (Nietzsche) forever hidden behind the veil of phenomena—is useless or idle. In a sense, then, the maxim-wielding pragmatist agrees with Oscar Wilde: only shallow people do not judge by appearances.

Moreover, theories and models are to be judged primarily by their fruits and consequences, not by their origins or their relations to antecedent data or facts. The basic idea is presented metaphorically by James and Dewey, for whom scientific theories are instruments or tools for coping with reality. As Dewey emphasized, the utility of a theory is a matter of its problem-solving power; pragmatic coping must not be equated with what delivers emotional consolation or subjective comfort. What is essential is that theories pay their way in the long run—that they can be relied upon time and again to solve pressing problems and to clear up significant difficulties confronting inquirers. To the extent that a theory functions or “works” practically in this way, it makes sense to keep using it—though we must always allow for the possibility that it will eventually have to be replaced by some theory that works even better. (See Section 2b below, for more on fallibilism.) An intriguing variant on this theme can arguably be found in Popper’s falsificationist philosophy of science: though never positively justified, theories (understood as bold conjectures or guesses) may still be rationally accepted provided repeated attempts to falsify them have failed.

b. Anti-Cartesianism

From Peirce and James to Rorty and Davidson, pragmatists have consistently sought to purify empiricism of vestiges of Cartesianism. They have insisted, for instance, that empiricism divest itself of that understanding of the mental which Locke, Berkeley, and Hume inherited from Descartes. According to such Cartesianism, the mind is a self-contained sphere whose contents—“ideas” or “impressions”—are irredeemably subjective and private, and utterly sundered from the public and objective world they purport to represent. Once we accept this picture of the mind as a world unto itself, we must confront a host of knotty problems—about solipsism, skepticism, realism, and idealism—with which empiricists have long struggled. Pragmatists have expressed their opposition to this Cartesian picture in many ways: Peirce´s view that beliefs are rules for action; James's teleological understanding of the mind; Dewey's Darwinian-inflected ruminations on experience; Popper's mockery of the “bucket theory of the mind”; Wittgenstein's private language argument; Rorty's refusal to view the mind as Nature's mirror; and Davidson's critique of “the myth of the subjective.” In these and other cases, the intention is emancipatory: pragmatists see themselves as freeing philosophy from optional assumptions which have generated insoluble and unreal problems.

Pragmatists also find the Cartesian “quest for certainty” (Dewey) quixotic. Pace Descartes, no statement or judgment about the world is absolutely certain or incorrigible. All beliefs and theories are best treated as working hypotheses which may need to be modified—refined, revised, or rejected—in light of future inquiry and experience. Pragmatists have defended such fallibilism by means of various arguments; here are sketches of five: (1) There is an argument from the history of inquiry: even our best, most impressive theories—Euclidean geometry and Newtonian physics, for instance—have needed significant and unexpected revisions. (2) If scientific theories are dramatically underdetermined by data, then there are alternative theories which fit said data. How then can we be absolutely sure we have chosen the right theory? (3) If we say (with Peirce) that the truth is what would be accepted at the end of inquiry, it seems we cannot be absolutely certain that an opinion of ours is true unless we know with certainty that we have reached the end of inquiry. But how could we ever know that? (See Section 2e below for more on Peirce’s theory of truth.) (4) There is a methodological argument as well: ascriptions of certainty block the road of inquiry, because they may keep us from making progress (that is, finding a better view or theory) should progress still be possible. (5) Finally, there is a political argument. Fallibilism, it is said, is the only sane alternative to a cocksure dogmatism, and to the fanaticism, intolerance, and violence to which such dogmatism can all too easily lead.

Pragmatists have also inveighed against the Cartesian idea that philosophy should begin with bold global doubt—that is, a doubt capable of demolishing all our old beliefs. Peirce, James, Dewey, Quine, Popper, and Rorty, for example, have all emphatically denied that we must wipe the slate clean and find some neutral, necessary or presuppositionless starting-point for inquiry. Inquiry, pragmatists are persuaded, can start only when there is some actual or living doubt; but, they point out, we cannot genuinely doubt everything at once (though they allow, as good fallibilists should, that there is nothing which we may not come to doubt in the course of our inquiries). This anti-Cartesian attitude is summed up by Otto Neurath’s celebrated metaphor of the conceptual scheme as raft: inquirers are mariners who must repair their raft plank by plank, adrift all the while on the open sea; for they can never disembark and scrutinize their craft in dry-dock from an external standpoint. In sum, we must begin in media res—in the middle of things—and confess that our starting-points are contingent and historically conditioned inheritances. One meta-philosophical moral drawn by Dewey (and seconded by Quine) was that we should embrace naturalism: the idea that philosophy is not prior to science, but continuous with it. There is thus no special, distinctive method on which philosophers as a caste can pride themselves; no transcendentalist faculty of pure Reason or Intuition; no Reality (immutable or otherwise) inaccessible to science for philosophy to ken or limn. Moreover, philosophers do not invent or legislate standards from on high; instead, they make explicit the norms and methods implicit in our best current practice.

Finally, it should be noted that pragmatists are unafraid of the Cartesian global skeptic—that is, the kind of skeptic who contends that we cannot know anything about the external world because we can never know that we are not merely dreaming. They have urged that such skepticism is merely a reductio ad absurdum of the futile quest for certainty (Dewey, Rescher); that skepticism rests on an untenable Cartesian philosophy of mind (Rorty, Davidson); that skepticism presupposes a discredited correspondence theory of truth (Rorty); that the belief in an external world is justified insofar as it “works,” or best explains our sensory experience (James, Schiller, Quine); that the problem of the external world is bogus, since it cannot be formulated unless it is already assumed that there is an external world (Dewey); that the thought that there are truths no one could ever know is empty (Peirce); and that massive error about the world is simply inconceivable (Putnam, Davidson).

c. The Kantian Inheritance

Pragmatism’s critique of Cartesianism and empiricism draws heavily—though not uncritically—on Kant. Pragmatists typically think, for instance, that Kant was right to say that the world must be interpreted with the aid of a scheme of basic categories; but, they add, he was dead wrong to suggest that this framework is somehow sacrosanct, immutable, or necessary. Our categories and theories are indeed our creations; they reflect our peculiar constitution and history, and are not simply read off from the world. But frameworks can change and be replaced. And just as there is more than one way to skin a cat, there is more than one sound way to conceptualize the world and its content. Which interpretative framework or vocabulary we should use—that of physics, say, or common sense—will depend on our purposes and interests in a given context.

The upshot of all this is that the world does not impose some unique description on us; rather, it is we who choose how the world is to be described. Though this idea is powerfully present in James, it is also prominent in later pragmatism. It informs Carnap’s distinction between internal and external questions, Rorty’s claim that Nature has no preferred description of itself, Goodman’s talk of world-making and of right but incompatible world-versions, and Putnam’s insistence that objects exist relative to conceptual schemes or frameworks.

Then there is the matter of appealing to raw experience as a source of evidence for our beliefs. According to the tradition of mainstream empiricism from Locke to Ayer, our beliefs about the world ultimately derive their justification from perception. What then justifies one's belief that the cat is on the mat? Not another belief or judgment, but simply one's visual experience: one sees said cat cavorting on said mat—and that is that. Since experience is simply “given” to the mind from without, it can justify one's basic beliefs (that is, beliefs that are justified but whose justification does not derive from any other beliefs). Sellars, Rorty, Davidson, Putnam, and Goodman are perhaps the best-known pragmatist opponents of this foundationalist picture. Drawing inspiration from Kant's dictum that “intuitions without concepts are blind,” they aver that to perceive is really to interpret and hence to classify. But if observation is theory-laden—if, that is, epistemic access to reality is necessarily mediated by concepts and descriptions—then we cannot verify theories or worldviews by comparing them with some raw, unsullied sensuous “Given.” Hence old-time empiricists were fundamentally mistaken: experience cannot serve as a basic, belief-independent source of justification.

More generally, pragmatists from Peirce to Rorty have been suspicious of foundationalist theories of justification according to which empirical knowledge ultimately rests on an epistemically privileged basis—that is, on a class of foundational beliefs which justify or support all other beliefs but which depend on no other beliefs for their justification. Their objections to such theories are many: that so-called “immediate” (or non-inferential) knowledge is a confused fiction; that knowledge is more like a coherent web than a hierarchically structured building; that there are no certain foundations for knowledge (since fallibilism is true); that foundational beliefs cannot be justified by appealing to perceptual experience (since the “Given” is a myth); and that knowledge has no overall or non-contextual structure whatsoever.

d. Against the Spectator Theory of Knowledge

Pragmatists resemble Kant in yet another respect: they, too, ferociously repudiate the Lockean idea that the mind resembles either a blank slate (on which Nature impresses itself) or a dark chamber (into which the light of experience streams). What these august metaphors seem intended to convey (among other things) is the idea that observation is pure reception, and that the mind is fundamentally passive in perception. From the pragmatist standpoint this is just one more lamentable incarnation of what Dewey dubbed “the spectator theory of knowledge.” According to spectator theorists (who range from Plato to modern empiricists), knowing is akin to seeing or beholding. Here, in other words, the knower is envisioned as a peculiar kind of voyeur: her aim is to reflect or duplicate the world without altering it—to survey or contemplate things from a practically disengaged and disinterested standpoint.

Not so, says Dewey. For Dewey, Peirce, and like-minded pragmatists, knowledge (or warranted assertion) is the product of inquiry, a problem-solving process by means of which we move from doubt to belief. Inquiry, however, cannot proceed effectively unless we experiment—that is, manipulate or change reality in certain ways. Since knowledge thus grows through our attempts to push the world around (and see what happens as a result), it follows that knowers as such must be agents; as a result, the ancient dualism between theory and practice must go by the board. This insight is central to the “experimental theory of knowledge,” which is Dewey’s alternative to the discredited spectatorial conception.

This repudiation of the passivity of observation is a major theme in pragmatist epistemology. According to James and Dewey, for instance, to observe is to select—to be on the lookout for something, be it for a needle in a haystack or a friendly face in a crowd. Hence our perceptions and observations do not reflect Nature with passive impartiality; first, because observers are bound to discriminate, guided by interest, expectation, and theory; second, because we cannot observe unless we act. But if experience is inconceivable apart from human interests and agency, then perceivers are truly explorers of the world—not mirrors superfluously reproducing it. And if acceptance of some theory or other always precedes and directs observation, we must break with the classical empiricist assumption that theories are derived from independently discovered data or facts.

Again, it is proverbial that facts are stubborn things. If we want to find out how things really are, we are counseled by somber common-sense to open our eyes (literally as well as figuratively) and take a gander at the world; facts accessible to observation will then impress themselves on us, forcing their way into our minds whether we are prepared to extend them a hearty welcome or not. Facts, so understood, are the antidote to prejudice and the cure for bias; their epistemic authority is so powerful that it cannot be overridden or resisted. This idea is a potent and reassuring one, but it is apt to mislead. According to holists such as James and Schiller, the justificatory status of beliefs is partly a function of how well they cohere or fit with entrenched beliefs or theory. Since the range of “facts” we can countenance or acknowledge is accordingly constrained by our body of previous acquired beliefs, no “fact” can be admitted into our minds unless it can be coherently assimilated or harmonized with beliefs we already hold. This amounts to a rejection of Locke’s suggestion that the mind is a blank slate, that is, a purely receptive and patient tabula rasa.

e. Beyond The Correspondence Theory of Truth

According to a longstanding tradition running from Plato to the present-day, truth is a matter of correspondence or agreement with reality (or with the aforementioned “facts”). But this venerable view is vague and beset with problems, say pragmatists. Here are just four: (1) How is this mysterious relation called “correspondence” to be understood or explicated? Not as copying, surely; but then how? (2) The correspondence theory makes a mystery of our practices of verification and inquiry. For we cannot know whether our beliefs are correspondence-true: if the “Given” is a myth, we cannot justify theories by comparing them with an unconceptualized reality. (3) It has seemed to some that traditional correspondence theories are committed to the outmoded Cartesian picture of the mind as Nature's mirror, in which subjective inner representations of an objective outer order are formed. (4) It has also been urged that there is no extra-linguistic reality for us to represent—no mind-independent world to which our beliefs are answerable. What sense, then, can be made of the suggestion that true thoughts correspond to thought-independent things?

Some pragmatists have concluded that the correspondence theory is positively mistaken and must be abandoned. Others, more cautious, merely insist that standard formulations of the theory are uninformative or incomplete. Schiller, Rorty, and Putnam all arguably belong to the former group; Peirce, James, Dewey, Rescher, and Davidson, to the latter.

Apart from criticizing the correspondence theory, what have pragmatists had to say about truth? Here three views must be mentioned: (1) James and Dewey are often said to have held the view that the truth is what “works”: true hypotheses are useful, and vice versa. This view is easy to caricature and traduce—until the reader attends carefully to the subtle pragmatist construal of utility. (What James and Dewey had in mind here was discussed above in Section 2a.) (2) According to Peirce, true opinions are those which inquirers will accept at the end of inquiry (that is, views on which we could not improve, no matter how far inquiry on that subject is pressed or pushed). Peirce's basic approach has inspired later pragmatists such as Putnam (whose “internal realism” glosses truth as ideal rational acceptability) as well as Apel and Habermas (who have equated truth with what would be accepted by all in an ideal speech situation). (3) According to Rorty, truth has no nature or essence; hence the less said about it, the better. To call a belief or theory “true” is not to ascribe any property to it; it is merely to perform some speech act (for example, to recommend, to caution, etc.). As Rorty sees it, his fellow pragmatists—James, Dewey, Peirce, Putnam, Habermas, and Apel—all err in thinking that truth can be elucidated or explicated.

3. Conclusion

For the most part, pragmatists have thought of themselves as reforming the tradition of empiricism—though some have gone further and recommended that tradition’s abolition. As this difference of opinion suggests, pragmatists do not vote en bloc. There is no such thing as the pragmatist party-line: not only have pragmatists taken different views on major issues (for example, truth, realism, skepticism, perception, justification, fallibilism, realism, conceptual schemes, the function of philosophy, etc.), they have also disagreed about what the major issues are. While such diversity may seem commendably in keeping with pragmatism’s professed commitment to pluralism, detractors have urged it only goes to show that pragmatism stands for little or nothing in particular. This gives rise to a question as awkward as it is unavoidable—namely, how useful is the term “pragmatism”? That question is wide open.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Borradori, G. (Ed.) The American Philosopher. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1994.
  • Flower, E. and Murphey, M. A History of Philosophy in America. New York: Putnam, 1997.
  • Kuklick, B. A History of Philosophy in America: 1720-2000. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
  • McDermid, D. The Varieties of Pragmatism: Truth, Realism, and Knowledge from James to Rorty. London and New York: Continuum, 2006.
  • Menand, L. The Metaphysical Club: A Story of Ideas in America. New York: Farrar Straus Giroux, 2001.
  • Murphy, J. Pragmatism: From Peirce to Davidson. Boulder: Westview Press, 1990.
  • Scheffler, I. Four Pragmatists: A Critical Introduction to Peirce, James, Mead, and Dewey. London and New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1986.
  • Shook, J. and Margolis, J. (Eds.) A Companion to Pragmatism. Oxford: Blackwell, 2006.
  • Stuhr, J. (Ed.) Pragmatism and Classical American Philosophy: Essential Readings and Interpretive Essays. New York: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Thayer, H.S. Meaning and Action: A Critical History of Pragmatism. 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1981.
  • West, C. The American Evasion of Philosophy: A Genealogy of Pragmatism. Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1989.

Author Information

Douglas McDermid
Email: dmcdermi@trentu.ca
Trent University, Canada

Richard Rorty (1931—2007)

Richard Rorty was an important American philosopher of the late twentieth and early twenty-first century who blended expertise in philosophy and comparative literature into a perspective called "The New Pragmatism" or “neopragmatism.” Rejecting the Platonist tradition at an early age, Rorty was initially attracted to analytic philosophy. As his views matured he came to believe that this tradition suffered in its own way from representationalism, the fatal flaw he associated with Platonism. Influenced by the writings of Darwin, Gadamer, Hegel and Heidegger, he turned towards Pragmatism.

Rorty’s thinking as a historicist and anti-essentialist found its fullest expression in 1979 in his most noted book, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Abandoning all claims to a privileged mental power that allows direct access to things-in-themselves, he offered an alternative narrative which adapts Darwinian evolutionary principles to the philosophy of language. The result was an attempt to establish a thoroughly naturalistic approach to issues of science and objectivity, to the mind-body problem, and to concerns about the nature of truth and meaning. In Rorty’s view, language is to be employed as an adaptive tool used to cope with the natural and social environments to achieve a desired, pragmatic end.

Motivating his entire program is Rorty’s challenge to the notion of a mind-independent, language-independent reality that scientists, philosophers, and theologians appeal to when professing their understanding of the truth. This greatly influences his political views. Borrowing from Dewey’s writings on democracy, especially where he promotes philosophy as the art of the politically useful leading to policies that are best, Rorty ties theoretical inventiveness to pragmatic hope. In place of traditional concerns about whether what one believes is well-grounded, Rorty, in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), advises that it is better to focus on whether one has been imaginative enough to develop interesting alternatives to one’s present beliefs. His assumption is that in a foundationless world, creative, secular humanism must replace the quest for an external authority (God, Nature, Method, and so forth) to provide hope for a better future. He characterizes that future as being free from dogmatically authoritarian assertions about truth and goodness. Thus, Rorty sees his New Pragmatism as the legitimate next step in completing the Enlightenment project of demystifying human life, by ridding humanity of the constricting "ontotheological" metaphors of past traditions, and thereby replacing the power relations of control and subjugation inherent in these metaphors with descriptions of relations based on tolerance and freedom.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Thoughts and Work
  3. Major Influences
    1. Hegel’s Historicism as Protopragmatism
    2. Darwin’s Evolution
    3. Heidegger: Contingency over Certainty
    4. Dewey’s Pragmatic Democracy
    5. Davidson on Truth and Meaning
  4. Positions
    1. Overview
    2. Philosophy: Neither Realism nor Antirealism
    3. Anti-essential Nominalism
    4. Anti-foundationalist Historicism
    5. Ethnocentricism
    6. Philosophy as Metaphor
    7. Anti-representational Metaphilosophy
    8. Pragmatic Pluralism
    9. Solidarities, Poets, and the Jeffersonian Strategy
    10. Non-reductive Materialism and the Self
  5. Critics
    1. Hilary Putnam, John McDowell, and James Conant
    2. Donald Davidson and Bjorn Ramberg
    3. Daniel Dennett
    4. Jurgen Habermas, Nancy Fraser, and Norman Geras
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. a. Works by Rorty
    2. b. Works about Rorty
    3. c. Further Reading

1. Life

Richard McKay Rorty was born on October 4, 1931 in New York City. He held teaching positions at Yale University from 1954 to 1956, Wellesley College from 1958 to 1961, Princeton University from 1961 to 1982, and the University of Virginia since 1982. In addition he has held many visiting positions.

As he relates in his autobiographical piece, "Trotsky and the Wild Orchids," Rorty’s early and informal education began with the books in his parents' library, particularly Leon Trotsky’s two books History of the Russian Revolution and Literature and Revolution as well as two volumes on the Dewey Commission of Inquiry into the Moscow Trials. These materials, along with his family’s association with noted socialists such as John Frank and Carlo Tresca, introduced Rorty to the plight of oppressed peoples and the fight for social justice.

At the age of fifteen in 1946, Rorty entered the University of Chicago where he eventually earned B.A. and M.A. degrees. After initially embracing Platonism and its replacement of passion by reason as a method to harmonize reality with the ideals of justice, a reluctant Rorty came to hold that this rapprochement was impossible. Opting rather for the rigors of the study of the philosophy of mind and analytic philosophy, Rorty left Chicago for Yale University, where he received his Ph.D. degree in 1956. He developed the theory of eliminativism materialism in "Mind-body Identity, Privacy and Categories" (1965), The Linguistic Turn (1967) and "In Defense of Eliminative Materialism" (1970). Here he clarifies and adjusts his commitment to the analytic tradition, a commitment that began with his Ph.D. dissertation “The Concept of Potentiality.” He eventually was to become disenchanted with analytic philosophy.

After reading Hegel’s Phenomenology of the Spirit, Rorty began to appreciate the degree to which the incessant conflict of philosophers and their competing first principles might, with the cunning of reason, be transformed from a seemingly interminable debate into a conversation that weaves itself into a “conceptual fabric of a freer, better, more just society.” This appreciation matured with Rorty’s study of Heidegger’s works.

During his tenure at Princeton University, Rorty was reintroduced to the works of John Dewey that he had set aside for his studies on Plato. It was this reacquaintance with Dewey, along with an acquaintance with the writings of Wilfrid Sellars and W. V. Quine that caused Rorty to redirect his interest to the study and development of the American philosophy of Pragmatism.

The publication of his first book, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature in 1979, the same year he became President of the American Philosophical Association, publicly marked Rorty’s thorough break with Platonic essentialism as well as with Cartesian foundationalism. He attacked assumptions at the core of modern epistemology—the conceptions of mind, of knowledge and of the discipline of philosophy.

Calling himself “raucously secularist,” Rorty rejected contemporary attempts at holding justice and reality in a single vision, declaring this to be a remnant of what Heidegger called the ontotheological tradition whose metaphors had frozen into dogmatic truisms about truth and goodness. In Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), Rorty extended this claim by abandoning all pretenses to an analytic style. Opting for a Proust-inspired narrative approach where arguments for universal rights, common humanity, and justice are replaced with references to pain and humiliation as motivation for society to form solidarities (contingent groupings of like-minded individuals) in opposition to suffering, Rorty substituted hope for knowledge as the main thrust of his efforts. Tolerant conversations rather than philosophical debates and idiosyncratic re-creation rather than self-discovery have been hallmarks of his pragmatic pursuit for social hope, the pursuit of which can be characterized as a historicist quest for human happiness that abandons a search for universal truth and timeless goodness in favor of what works. Rorty’s pragmatic aim was and continues to be the development of a liberal society where there is freedom from pain and humiliation and where open-mindedness is practiced.

More recently, Rorty developed his notion of the uses of philosophy by using as his template a reading of Darwinian evolution applied to Deweyan democratic principles. This development appears most notably in Achieving Our Country (1998), Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers III (1998) and in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999). Rorty died on June 8, 2007.

2. Thoughts and Work

The failure of Rorty’s youthful attempt to synthesize into one vision his identification with the downtrodden together with his search for the "Truth beyond hypothesis" was the making of his career in philosophy. As early as 1967, Rorty had moved away from an initial interest in linguistic philosophy as a way of finding a neutral standpoint from which to establish a strict science of language, and he began his shift to pragmatism. With the publication of Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979), Rorty further elucidated his maturing anti-essentialist, historicist positions as applied to topics such as the philosophy of science and the mind-body problem, as well as the philosophy of language as it pertained to issues of truth and meaning. With Consequences of Pragmatism (1982), Rorty developed in greater detail the themes covered in his 1979 work.

With Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), Rorty first implicitly linked his rejection of philosophical appeals to ahistorical universals with that of his pragmatist narrative, a narrative of free, idiosyncratic individuals who, inspired by intuitions and sensibilities captured in great works of literature, commit themselves to contingent solidarities devoted to social and political liberalism. Furthermore, these individuals, detached from the need to justify their world-view by an appeal to the way the world is, would see moral obligation as a matter of social conditioning by cultural forces, which are in turn structured by the prevalent human needs and desires of a specific era.

In Part III of Objectivity, Relativism and Truth (1991), Rorty continued to develop his pragmatist views on politics in a democratic society. In Parts I and II he set his sights on contemporary ideas about objectivity, using the writings of Donald Davidson and others for support in debunking the claim that the human mind is capable of discovering ahistorical truth concerning the nature and meaning of reality from a “God’s-eye,” ideal perspective. Supporting the entire work is Rorty’s challenge to the notion of a mind-independent, language-independent reality to which scientists, philosophers, and politicians appeal when professing that they have a corner on the truth. His Essays on Heidegger and Others (1991) is devoted to harmonizing the works of Heidegger and Derrida with the writings of Dewey and Davidson, particularly in their anti-representational insights and stances on contingent historicism.

Later writings, such as Truth and Progress (1998); Achieving our Country: Leftist Thoughts in Twentieth-Century America (1998); and Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), clarify his anti-essentialist stance by integrating a neo-Darwinian perspective into a Dewey-inspired pragmatism.

3. Major Influences

Although the writing of any philosopher will have countless influences, there are generally only a handful which stand out as major inspirations. Rorty is no exception. While Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, Derrida, James, Quine, and Kuhn contribute much to his worldview, of central importance to Rorty’s narrative of New Pragmatism are five influential thinkers: G. W. F. Hegel, Charles Darwin, Martin Heidegger, John Dewey, and Donald Davidson, each contributing a significant layer to Rorty’s complex take on questions central to contemporary philosophy.

a. Hegel’s Historicism as Protopragmatism

It was G. W. F. Hegel’s willingness in his Phenomenology of the Spirit (1977) to abandon certainty and eternity as philosophical and moral goals/ideals that inspired Rorty to appreciate the irreducible temporality of everything as well as to understand philosophy as a contingent narrative readable without a moral precept existing behind the storyline. Calling Hegel’s switch from the metaphor of individual salvation through contact with a transcendental reality to salvation through the achievement of the completion of an historical process “protopragmatism,” Rorty asserts that this move was a critical step forward in human thinking, taking us from the notion of how things were meant to be to a perspective on how things never were but might be. The change of focus from epistemological stasis, the adequate discernment of God’s Will or Nature’s Way, to interpretive processes opened the way for subsequent intellectuals to envision their task as that of constructing a better future rather than the discovery and conforming to a static idea of the Good Life. The refocused purpose of philosophy, from Rorty’s perspective, would be best captured by Hegel’s phrase “time held in thought,” that is, a narrative of a community’s progress across time that can be described in terms of its current and parochial needs; societal growth not measured against some non-human, eternal standard. Thus, Rorty contends, Hegel helped us to begin to substitute pragmatic hope for apodictic knowledge.

Of course, Hegel saw his own philosophical efforts as elucidating the progression by which the rational becomes real. That is, he conceived history as the process of the Absolute becoming increasingly self-manifest (the Incarnate Logos) through the development toward, and concrete realization in, the human consciousness. This Rorty rejects as a form of pantheistic fantasy that attempts to maintain a “closeness of fit” between word and world by rendering humanity as the mere manifestation of the Divine Mind, and one that is not consistent, ironically, with Hegel’s own anti-representational doctrine of historicism. To address this inconsistency and for a corrective to Hegel’s Absolute Idealism, Rorty turns to Charles Darwin.

b. Darwin’s Evolution

In 1998 Rorty contended that Darwin has demonstrated how to naturalize Hegel by the former’s dispensing with claims that the real is rational while allowing for a narrative of change understood as an endless series of progressive unfolding. Purpose that transcends a given organism is eliminated in favor of a particular organism’s fitness for the local environment. It is an evolutionary process, one that fully involves human beings; we are no exception. What we, as creatures of the earth, do and are, Rorty maintains, “is continuous with what amoebas, spiders, and squirrels do and are.” Consciousness and thought are not distinct kinds; they are inextricably linked to the use of language. Language is the practice of using long and complex strings of noises and marks to successfully adapt to one’s environment. If language is at all a break in the continuity between other species and humans, it is only insofar as it is a tool that humans have at their disposal, which amoebas, squirrels, and the like do not. Nevertheless, just as other species have developed the tools of night-hunting, migration and hibernation to adapt to environmental change, we have used language as a tool for our survival. Thus, for Rorty, language is not a mysterious add-on over and above human creaturehood, but part of our “animality,” as he puts it. As a conveyer of meaning, language should be understood as the use of sentences to achieve a practical goal through a cooperative effort. It is “the ability to have and ascribe sentential attitudes” that contributes to our species’ successful survival in a world of dynamic possibilities. In this way, borrowing from Darwin, Rorty naturalizes language.

Darwin also has made materialism respectable to an educated public once, according to Rorty (Truth and Progress, 1998), his “vitalism” is dismissed. Darwin’s detailed account of the way in which both life and consciousness might have evolved from non-living, non-conscious chemical soup gave plausibility to their emergence free from teleology. Taking the new-found respectability of materialism along with the recognition of the human species’ full-fledged animality, the search for a non-natural cause for the prolific display of life on earth can be dispensed with as misguided. So too can a hunt for a non-human purpose for human life. “After Darwin,” Rorty asserts, “it became possible to believe that nature is not leading up to anything—that nature has nothing in mind.”

Without transcendent standards or intrinsic ends to aspire to, we humans find ourselves radically free to invent the purpose of human life and the means to achieve it. Rorty, well aware of the need for a consistent anti-representationalist narrative, acknowledges that even Darwin’s theory of evolutionary change is just one more image of the way things “are,” one no more privileged than any other coherent narrative in representing reality in-itself—an impossible task. In fact Rorty suggests that the main, albeit unintended, contribution of Darwin is the de-mythologizing of the human self (considered as part of an unnarrated, objective reality). Rorty argues that we should “read Darwin not as offering one more theory about what we really are but as providing reasons why we do not need to ask what we really are.” Old habits of deferentially attributing to an immaterial spirit or to nature’s intrinsic life-force (for example, élan vital) the power to determine the structure, meaning of, and means to our existence ought to be set aside as outmoded and replaced by a story of dynamic cultural innovation and humanistic pluralism. This is the pragmatic vocabulary that Rorty envisions Darwin preparing with his notion of evolutionary change, a vocabulary that is further molded by the writings of Martin Heidegger.

c. Heidegger: Contingency over Certainty

Martin Heidegger influenced Rorty in the direction of process over permanence. Labeling the history of Western metaphysics “the ontotheological tradition,” Heidegger postulated that an underlying assumption persisted from Plato down to the positivists: the power relation of “the stronger overcoming the weaker.” Rorty (in “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” 1991) notes that Heidegger finds that thinkers as diverse as Aristotle, St. Paul, Descartes, and Hegel assume this sort of asymmetrical power relation in the process of searching for the truth that overcomes ignorance, tames sensual desire by reason, or defeats sin with the aid of God’s grace. Each thinker in his own fashion seeks a force that overwhelms the subject as it makes its project evident. By doing so, the individual ceases to create and live his own projects in deference to the presence of the stronger influence. The submission to this influence would be both a concession to a power greater than oneself and identification with it. And it is in this identification, Heidegger claimed, that a subtle shift from an attitude of subservience to one of control and domination occurs within the seeker.

Rorty agrees with Heidegger that the “quest for certainty, clarity, and direction from outside can also be viewed as an attempt to escape from time, to view Sein as something that has little to do with Zeit.” For the ontotheological tradition, time, in its fleeting manifestations, receives the unfavorable comparison with the reality of the eternal. Thus the unspoken goal of the metaphysically-inclined advocates of this philosophical tradition is to be free from the contingency, the uncertainty, and the fragility of the human condition by a release into and identification with the eternal. Valuing power above fragility, propositions over words, truth to metaphor, philosophy above poetry, in the hands of pre-Heideggerian philosophers the use of language becomes merely a means in the pursuit of a reality and a force which rises above the signifier.

Heidegger rejected this family of philosophical thinking along with its “quest for disinterested theoretical truth” as an over-intellectualized escape from the human condition. It is at its core inauthentic. The will to truth of the metaphysician is actually the poetic urge in disguise. Since antiquity, the ontotheological tradition is the attempt by (poetic) thinkers to deploy a series of metaphors to break away from the contingency of poetic metaphor. More than hypocritical, in Heidegger eyes, the ontotheologian exhibits hubris in his belief that Western philosophy is capable of getting it right and be clear about what is real, rather than appreciating his attempt as just one of many practices trying to give voice to the “reality” of Being. Instead Heidegger urged that an amalgamation of beliefs and desires had to be made in order to recover and reassert the “force of words” heard as when they were first spoken—original and potent—in order to open a space for Being.

Rorty understands Heidegger to be saying that there are just we humans and the power of the words we happen to speak. There is no designer, no controller, and no choreographer of human projects, only ourselves and the languages we create. “We are nothing save the words we use.” Thus the poet, in dealing forthrightly with the contingency and historicity of words is an authentic coiner of metaphor. And metaphor is what discloses Being, just as Being is formed and manifested in metaphor. As Rorty writes in “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” “As long as an understanding of Being is ontically possible ‘is there’ Being.”

The use of the term “Being” by Heidegger is, for Rorty, somewhat problematic. With Heidegger, Rorty agrees that there is no hidden power called Being. Rorty interprets Heidegger’s Being as what “final vocabularies” are about. When he declares that “Being’s poem is the poem of Being,” Rorty is not claiming that there is a work of reality that Being “writes”; rather he means that there is no meta-vocabulary to distinguish the adequacy of one final vocabulary above others. Nor is there any non-linguistic, pre-cognitive access to an already present Being that underscores some narrative as preferred. There is no way to escape the contingencies of language to get at Being-in-itself. We are all enmeshed in final vocabularies that present Being in diverse and incommensurate ways. No understanding of Being is better than any other understanding. Heidegger thus cleared the way for Rorty’s dismissal of the realism-antirealism debate and his gloss of Western tradition as the development of pragmatic practices designed to cope with contemporary conditions while remaining open to future descriptions.

Nevertheless, for Heidegger the evolving pattern of power relations that has been the history of Western metaphysics culminates in the “technical,” pragmatic interpretation of thinking. Rorty obviously must differ with Heidegger in the latter’s rejection of pragmatism as the concluding, and unfortunate, outcome of the ontotheological tradition. In “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” Rorty suggests that if Heidegger had only to choose between pragmatism and Platonism, pragmatism would be his choice, fully aware of Heidegger’s distain for pragmatism and his offering of a third option: authentic Dasein’s primal understanding of Being. Yet Rorty maintains that he opts for the early Heidegger’s construal of the “analytic of Dasein” as an interpretation of the Western world-view rather than the later Heidegger’s reading of it as “an account of the ahistorical conditions for the occurrence of history.” In doing so Rorty dismisses all suggestions by Heidegger that some historically embedded language-users’ understanding of Being (for example, the ancient Greeks’) can be more open to (less forgetful of) Being than any subsequent appreciation due to their status as “primordial” inventors of the Western tradition’s metaphors. Yet Rorty also insists that it is impossible to rank understandings because no descriptive account can better help us get behind that which is poetically construed. There is no validating reality behind our narrative; Being and interpretive narrative arise together. Therefore, Rorty appropriates for pragmatism only Heidegger’s sense of contingency and the transitory condition of human life, along with the ability to radically redescribe Western culture. He sets aside Heidegger’s nostalgia for an authentic world-view that says something neutral about the structure of all present and possible world-views. By doing so, Rorty aligns himself more with John Dewey’s brand of anti-essentialism and anti-foundationalism than with Heidegger’s project. For Dewey’s vision of a democratic utopia includes “technical,” pragmatic thinking that is put in service to social practice for the purpose of achieving the integration of inquiry and poetry, theory and practice.

d. Dewey’s Pragmatic Democracy

As with Hegel and Darwin, Rorty intentionally “misreads” or “redescribes” John Dewey from a late-Twentieth-century pragmatist’s perspective. This “hypothetical Dewey” is shorn of what Rorty considers to be dead metaphors in the former’s philosophy (that is his “scientistic” empirical rhetoric and panpsychic notion of experience). Conversely for Rorty, a continuing live option in Dewey’s thought is his naturalism and pragmatism. Seen in this light, Rorty’s Dewey becomes the synthesis of historicism and the expediency of evolutionary adaptation. Most notably, Dewey manifested this fusion in his rejection of the “crust of convention” born of a tradition that took language as representational of reality rather than as instrumental in satisfying a society’s shared beliefs and hopes. The fading conviction originating with Plato that language can adequately represent what there is in words opens the way for a pragmatic utilization of language as a means to address current needs through practical deliberations among thoughtful people.

This view of language is critical for Rorty. With the shift in attitude away from the expectation, on one hand, that through narrative a revelation of moral perfection may become manifest, or, on the other, that through the clear and methodical use of language epistemic certainty may be achieved, humanity is freed to view morality and science as being evolving processes, where means lead to ends and those ends in turn become means toward future aims. Rorty characterizes this, Dewey’s means-ends continuum, as the claim that we change our ideas of what is true, right and good on the basis of the particular blend of success and failure produced by our prior labors to fulfill our hopes. Rorty writes that philosophers such as Dewey “have kept alive the historicist sense that this century’s ‘superstition’ was the last century’s triumph of reason and the relativist sense that the latest vocabulary, borrowed from the latest scientific achievement, may not express privileged representations of essences, but be just another of the potential infinity of vocabularies in which the world can be described.”

In rejecting representationalism and the essentialism that it implies, Dewey abandons the Cartesian-inspired spectator account of knowledge, which radically separates the knowing subject from the object being studied. No longer considering that objectivity a result of a detachment from the material under study but rather as an ongoing interaction with that which is at hand, Dewey elevates practice over theory; better said, he puts theory in service to practice. From Rorty’s perspective, while Dewey had a great insight, he ought to have taken the next step and rejected scientism—the claim that scientific method allows humanity to gain a privileged insight into the structural processes of nature. His failure to reject the alleged epistemologically privileged stance is one main reason Rorty must re-imagine Dewey. Nevertheless, Dewey’s elevation of practice continues the movement away from the pre-Darwinian attachment to the belief in a non-human source of purpose and the immutability of natural kinds toward a contingent “world,” where humans define and redefine their social and material environments. It is within a social practice or a “language-game” that specific marks and sounds come to designate commonly accepted meanings. And, as Rorty states in “Feminism and Pragmatism,” (1995) no set of marks or sounds (memes) can ever bring cognitive clarity about the way the world is or the way we as humans are. Instead, memes compete with one another in an evolutionary struggle over cultural space, just as genes compete for survival in the natural environment. Unguided by an immanent or transcendent teleology, the memes’ replication is determined by their usefulness within a given social group. And it is through their utility for the continued existence and prospering of a social group that the group’s memes—like their genes—are carried forward and flourish. They establish their niche in the socio-ecological system.

By the linkage of meme selection with Darwinian natural selection, Rorty can reasonably say that “the history of social practices is continuous with the history of biological evolution.” He adds a crucial caveat: memes gradually usurp the role of genes. Thus the driving force in human existence becomes the socio-linguistic. And as in the process of natural selection there is no social practice that is privileged and final; no one cultural “species” is intrinsically favored over another. It follows that, as Dewey has said “The worse or evil is a rejected good.” Before deliberation and choice there can be no intrinsic good, no God’s-Eye clarity as to what the true, the right and the just are. All options are competing goods. It is only with the triumph of one set of memes over another by means of manipulation, coercion or force that the determination of a society’s memes as the good (or the bad) of the situation can be asserted. Rorty recognizes that the Deweyan approach, which denies that knowledge is the stable grasping of an independent reality and which asserts “reality” to be a term of value, may lead to the charge of relativism and power-worship. But he believes that the benefits for a democratic society where there is an unfettered competition of ideas outweigh the downside of his anti-universalist stance. Therefore, given the historicist belief that there is no viable alternative to being immersed within the contemporary understanding of one’s time, place and culture, then to abandon the memes with which one chooses to be identified—together with the solidarity one has formed with like-minded others around those memes—would be an absurd denial of one’s self and one’s beliefs. (This is the basis of Rorty’s ethnocentricism.)

Rorty wishes to promote consciously a democracy of plurality and hope rather than one where either private autonomy or communal solidarity dominates. This sentiment can be found most clearly beginning with Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), culminating in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999). By developing an evolutionary sense of history through Dewey’s writings Rorty associates a generalized Darwinism directly with democracy. Growth, or the flourishing of ideas in a political environment that is conducive to the flowering of ideas and practices, is the hope for the future. While there is no metaphysical grounding of this hope in the essence of humanity or in the structure of the world, Rorty maintains that a future where we may continue to be astounded by the latest creative endeavors is a future where human happiness has the best chance.

This democratic trope is acceptable to Rorty because he agrees with Dewey that the essentialist-foundationalist worldview was a product of Europe’s inegalitarian past. The conservative, leisure-class’s desire to maintain the status quo was incorporated into a philosophy that favored eternal necessities over the temporal contingencies and the uncovering of static natures over the engagement with the dynamic processes. As such it stood in the way of growth and constructive change. By shifting attention away from traditional memes to those that focuses on the future, Dewey meant to reconstruct philosophy into the exercise of practical judgment, a dedication to the kinds of understanding that are geared to contemporary obstacles that obstruct the flow of expressive creativity. Rorty endorses Dewey’s intention.

As Rorty characterizes Dewey’s vision, Pragmatism would, for the first time, “put the intellectuals at the service of the productive class rather than the leisure class.” Theory is to be treated as an aid to practice, rather than practice being seen as defective theory. With the assent of practice, the distinctions characteristic of dualism, those between mind and matter, thought and action, and appearance and reality, blur and fall away. Following precisely on this notion is political egalitarianism. If there is not to be dualistic distinction in the abstract, then none should be manifested in practice. Rorty accepts that individual self-reliance ought to be exercised on a communal level. Dewey promotes philosophy as the art of the politically useful. His is a social democracy where the policies that bring social utility are the policies that are best. This is where theoretical creativity ties into Rortyan pragmatic hope: “that one should stop worrying about whether what one believes is well-grounded and start worrying about whether one has been imaginative enough to think up interesting alternatives to one’s present beliefs.” Rorty holds that this is uniquely possible for all citizens in a democratic environment, where the clash of memes can happen under an auspicious tolerance that suppresses to a minimum pain and humiliation and allow for a flourishing of diversity. This is where pragmatism fuses with utilitarian values. Rorty suggests that it is reasonable to offer persuasive rhetoric rather than the use of physical assault or its preludes of mockery and insult, because coming to terms with people will likely increase human happiness in the long run. That is, by keeping open the lines of communication, new and exciting projects for the betterment of our condition has the best chance to develop than if fear and intimidation are the norm. It is the establishment of conditions conducive for human happiness that is the utopian hope within the human heart.

e. Davidson on Truth and Meaning

Rorty had claimed (prior to Ramberg’s essay—see section 5b below) that there was no more of a gap between human psychology and biology than between biology and chemistry (“McDowell, Davidson, and Spontaneity”, 1998). This follows easily from his Deweyan take on Darwinism. Once we accept Dewey’s pragmatism, then the vocabularies that allegedly could distinguish between the human and the natural come under serious challenge. Different disciplines are founded to achieve different purposes. There is no way for a discipline to try to be more “adequate to the world” than any other when, with Rorty, one gives up on, say, Quine’s physicalism which ranks some vocabulary (physics) as ontologically superior to others. If we generalize this rejection, as Rorty does, then one is able to reject scientism, a position which holds that a descriptive practice’s success or failure depends on its capture of a determinative material reality. Once we abandon the idea that one vocabulary is best suited to express the intrinsic order of things, then the ability to express the truth through the use of one vocabulary but not another is due to the different focus of interest that each vocabulary has, and not because one excels beyond all others in the expression of facts. There is a flat, deontologized, playing field among different descriptive strategies. These strategies are tools in the pragmatist’s toolbox to be utilized under appropriate conditions of need-fulfillment. So, for instance, if psychology is rightly conceived as a different practice than, say, economics, it is a practice that is geared to achieve a particular outcome deemed as important by the discipline of psychology, but not necessarily to economics, or for that matter, physics, ethics, and so forth. Psychology is merely a different causal strategy which an individual may choose to engage “nature” to achieve a specific outcome. But no strategy can claim to have the unique language-strategy that gets things right. Rorty believes there is no “super-language” that achieves a more adequate description of our relation to something other than ourselves because all vocabularies merely describe our practices as we engage in a causal interaction with “reality” as understood through those practices.

This position is available to Rorty largely due to Donald Davidson’s argument against the content-scheme distinction. This distinction, common in all dualisms, is seen as necessary only when credence is given to there being disparate ontological realms—one containing beliefs, the other containing non-beliefs (for example, matters of fact). Truth then becomes the correct analysis of the non-causal relation between particular beliefs and specific non-beliefs. But Davidson argues that such a dichotomy lacks credibility. That there is a mysterious relation between human and the non-human which tertia such as “experience,” “sensory stimulation,” “the world,” and so forth, act as epistemological bridges is, according to Davidson, an illusion created by the endeavor to take language as a medium or an instrument used to define truth. Rorty explains that Davidson avoids this representationalist pitfall by understanding “true” in terms of one’s own linguistic know-how. The “language I know,” the way that one’s community copes with the environment in practice, is enough to erase the alleged schism between intentional objects (the objects that most of the rules of action of one’s—or some other—linguistic community are true of; that is, are good for dealing with) and their referents. This is Davidson’s “Principle of Charity.”

The central understanding that Rorty draws from Davidson’s notion of “radical translation” at the heart of the “Principle of Charity” is that we language-users have already the causal link established between our beliefs and their referent(s). There is no need to establish a connection, it is the human condition. This linkage allows us to get things for the most part correct and thus make most of our statements about the world true, and to recognize that any translation is a faulty translation which renders as wrong most of a speaker’s beliefs about the world. Rorty suggests that it follows that any wholesale gap between intentional objects and referents would be impossible since survival depended upon humanity’s pragmatic application of beliefs to the environment. This carries over to our own individual webs of belief. Most of anyone’s beliefs must be, on the whole, true. Rorty uses this insight to explain that though we cannot get outside our beliefs and our language to establish some test besides the coherence of our own or others’ webs of belief we can still speak objectively and have knowledge of a public world not of our personal design.

It is through a Davidsonian holistic view of language that Rorty, contra Davidson, takes “truth” as a misguided slide back into representationalism. For Davidson, truth is a transparent term that in itself does not explain anything but emerges when the rules for action causally interact successfully with the world. Rorty rejects all appeals to truth, Davidsonian or otherwise, in favor of social justification. Because there are no comprehensive barriers between oneself and the world, we are free to advance beliefs with the aim of persuading others as to their efficacy in obtaining the outcomes they most desire. This is how Rorty blends Davidson’s notion of radical translation with Dewey’s naturalism to yield Rorty’s neopragmatism.

4. Positions

a. Overview

The overarching theme of Rorty’s writing is a promotion of a thorough-going naturalism. Recognizing the value of the Enlightenment challenge to religious speculation, and its offering of a humanist philosophy in its place, Rorty argues that the Enlightenment program was never completed. It fell short of its goal by keeping one foot in the past. By substituting the notion of Truth as One in place of a monotheistic worldview, the Enlightenment reformers repeated the tradition’s error by continuing to seek non-human authority, now in the guise of what Wilfrid Sellers called “the Myth of the Given.” Holding that reality has an intrinsic nature, and by advancing the correspondence theory of truth, Enlightenment philosophers turned away from full-blown naturalism, ironically, in service to a scientific objectivity that required a radical separation of the observer from the observed. Rorty’s neopragmatism is meant to ameliorate this perceived shortcoming by rigorously following through on Immanuel Kant’s distinction between causality and justification.

Rorty holds that our relation with the environment is purely causal. However, the way in which we describe it—the linguistic tools we employ to cope with the recalcitrance of that environment in an effort to achieve our purposes and desires, as natural creatures in the natural world—determines how we understand that world. Once we are causally prompted to form a belief, justification may take place in a social world where, as Davidson notes, only a belief can justify a belief. In short, Rorty maintains that there can be no norms derived from the natural, but only from the social.

This position allows Rorty to reject scientism (the representationalist view that cleaves to the Myth of the Given) while endorsing the development of a fully-naturalized science as an extremely useful tool for prediction and control. It also opens the way for Rorty to advance naturalized democracy with confidence. Instead of seeking some underlying fact about human nature which is essential, ahistorical, and universalizable, Rorty proposes we seek the justifications that are relevant to a contextually embedded practice. The loss of the unconditionality associated with long-established notions of truth is actually a gain, pragmatically speaking. While truth is an aim that is unachievable due to its definitional ambivalence prior to commitment to action, justification is a recognizable (and contingent) goal that permits practical satisfaction without closing the door on future recalibrations in response to inevitable challenges to such justifications. The best way to allow for justification of a belief with no neutral standpoint, Rorty suggests, is to allow competing beliefs to be evaluated on their performance capabilities and not on their ability to ground themselves in universal validity. This leads directly to Rorty’s ethnocentricism.

The following are various positions Rorty takes in accordance with his project of New Pragmatism.

b. Philosophy: Neither Realism nor Antirealism

For Rorty one of the results of the merging of Dewey’s naturalism with Davidson’s view of truth is the dropping of the realist-anti-realist issue. One is always in touch with reality as a language user, thus the distinction between truth-conditions and assertibility-conditions dissolves. However, it is important to note that although we humans use language to engage the environment it does not make the process artificial, in the sense of language concealing a transcendent reality behind social constructs, or by its being in wholesale error concerning the inherent character of the natural world. Rorty writes in Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth (1991) that “Davidson, on my interpretation, thinks that the benefit of going ‘linguistic’ is that getting rid of the Cartesian mind is the first step toward eliminating the tertia which, by seeming to intrude between us and the world, created the old metaphysical issues in the first place.” He continues that once we dispense with the tertia that try to breach the now discredited scheme-content gap, the distinction between appearance (“useful fictions”) and reality (“objective facts”) disappears. What remain are one’s community practices unfolding in a seamless and endless process of reweaving webs of beliefs in response to current and future conditions. From his rejection of the realist-anti-realist distinction springs Rorty’s anti-essentialist nominalism and anti-foundationalism.

c. Anti-essential Nominalism

Related to Rorty’s rejection of what he characterizes as the false dichotomy between realism and antirealism, is his dismissal of all ideas of essentialism. The Neurath’s Boat thought experiment poses no problem for Rorty. Terms like “boat” or “self” are strictly linguistic in nature. That is, they do not refer to Platonic Forms or Aristotelian essences, but to linguistically constructed, intentional objects. Boats or selves may undergo complete change piece-by-piece and still maintain their identity if and only if there is social agreement about the continuance of such notions. What is radical in Rorty’s linguistic principle is that there is no ultimate difference between the human and the non-human “entities;” they are definable and redefinable “all the way down.” There is nothing standing under [sub-stance] or above to anchor the ever-evolving linguistic parsing of metaphors.

Similarly, reference to reflexive consciousness, the hallmark of unique and private Cartesian self distinct from all non-conscious objects is, for Rorty an illegitimate attempt to nest metaphysical assertions about the existence of a separate human mind in the epistemology of first-person, self-evident awareness. Equally illegitimate is the appeal to materialism common to scientism. Language that reduces consciousness to brain functions creates a vocabulary that attempts to explain mental events as happenings of material alteration. There is a metaphysical assumption in materialism that Rorty, as an anti-essentialist, cannot countenance: that there is a physical world that is “really there” adequate to the cause of the mental.

Neither a reductive materialist nor dualistic subjectivist, Rorty opts for nominalist-pragmatism. That materialists deal with reality is to be understood as their concentrating on the concepts and descriptors they find most useful to discuss. When dualists maintain that there is an awareness which stands distinct from that which is extended and non-conscious, it shows their stubborn commitment to the dead Cartesian metaphor. Descartes’ reconstruction of the world was designed to secure the study of physics in a religious environment hostile to its practice. To reify Descartes’ “mind as a mental eye” metaphor as that which “perceives” itself as a self-evident “given” is to misunderstand the application of language to personal experience. This is a major theme of Rorty’s Philosophy as the Mirror of Nature (1979), as captured in his “Antipodean Analogy.” It is a challenge and reminder to the reader that the way we speak about the mental can (and will at some future time) be radically reconceived. If there can be found nothing essential to the mental that extends beyond and grounds our description of it, the very process with which we seem most intimate, then it follows that there is nothing essential—non-linguistic—to the non-mental either. There is no essential constitution to our minds. Rorty declares that privacy, immediacy, introspectibility, intentionality, incorrigibility, and self-evidency can be redescribed in terms that do not involve subjectivism (see also “Dennett on Awareness”).

d. Anti-foundationalist Historicism

Rorty denies the utility of all foundational philosophies (for example, Cartesian clear and distinct ideas, Kantian a priori truths, and so forth) on the basis that they share with representationalism a belief that the mind is the “mirror of nature.” Once the metaphysical distinction between appearance and reality disappears, so too ought the need for a knowing subject with a special faculty for apodictic truth. Seen by Rorty as secular theories meant to identify the necessary grounding of knowledge previously provided by the Divine or natural order, foundationalisms of all stripes have in common the desire for the subject to escape temporality and contingency into a transcendent viewpoint capable of experiencing the power of truth (for example, “truth resists attempts to refute it”), pressing rational minds toward consensus. Thus, in Rorty’s opinion, the invention of the transcendent subject is an attempt to salvage epistemologically a relation to a metaphysical realm that has been abandoned by post-Kantian thinkers. He holds that foundationalists arbitrarily raise to the level of universal the mundane linguistic practices and social norms that have dominated minds at some moment and in some locale. Rorty rejects the cultural hegemony implied in foundationalist narratives, and by doing so asserts a historicist belief in the inescapable embeddedness of the human condition in the flux and flow of evolutionary change. There is, from his perspective, no neutral, ahistorical standpoint, no “God’s-eye viewpoint” from which to gain a Parmenidean perspective on what there is. What we can assent to is a plurality of standpoints that achieve social acceptance because of their utility in and for the here and now.

e. Ethnocentricism

A natural order of reason is one more “relic” of the idea that truth consists of correspondence to the intrinsic nature of things. Absent an ahistorical standpoint from which to judge the intrinsic nature of reality, there is no such thing as a proposition that is justified without qualification or an argument which will better approximate the truth per se. For Rorty, there is no natural context-independent reason which somehow heralds and underlies all descriptive vocabulary. He considers the idea of context-independent truth a misguided effort to hypostatize the adjective “true” by repackaging it in epistemological terms of the Platonic attempt to hypostatize the adjective ‘good.’ Only such hypostatization causes one to believe that there is a goal of inquiry beyond justification to relevant contemporary audiences. Rorty holds: “All reasons are reasons for a particular people, restrained by spatial, temporal, and social conditions.” When we have justified our beliefs to an audience considered pertinent, we need not make any further claims, universal or otherwise.

To insist on context-independence would be to endow reason with causal powers that enable a particular descriptive vocabulary to resist refutation regardless of time, place, and social conditions. Alternately, one could suppose an ideal audience with the ability to speak a privileged vocabulary that allows its speakers to escape human limits and achieve a God-like grasp of the totality of possibility. But Rorty insists that there is neither such an audience, nor a privileged vocabulary that provides a priori a language of justification with the potential to draw all mundane audiences into universal consensus. There are only diverse linguistic communities, each of which has its own final vocabulary and its shared context-embedded perspective on reality, a reality that is forever and already interpreted from that standpoint.

Since, from the Rortyan outlook, the reality-appearance distinction is a relic of our authoritarian ontotheological tradition—the transmutation of the extrinsic, non-human power (that must be submitted to) into the secularized intrinsic nature of reality that still carries with it all the authoritarian drawbacks inherent in the tradition’s outdated metaphor (for example, Habermasian “universal validity”)—then the secularized metaphor of power/submission ought to be discarded along with the remnants of its religious origin.

But Rorty does not want to throw out entirely the fruits of Western culture. To the contrary, he says that he is “lucky” to having been raised within this cultural tradition, especially because of its tendencies for critical analysis and tolerance. In this vein, Rorty responds to a Habermasian critique: “I regard it a fortunate historical accident that we find ourselves in a culture . . . which is highly sensitized to the need to go beyond (dogmatic borders of thought).” Nevertheless, he does not hold that his luck is any different from that felt by Germans who considered themselves fortunate to enroll in the Hitler Youth. It’s simply a chance matter as to which society one is born, and what set of beliefs is valued therein.

Carrying forward his naturalistic, Darwinian views, Rorty sees humans as creatures whose beliefs and desires are for the most part formed by a process of acculturation. With no non-relative criteria or standards for telling real justifications from merely apparent ones, it follows that there can be no teleological mechanism independent of specific social narratives to determine the socioethical superiority of one solidarity over another. Since we all acquire our moral identity and obligations from our native culture (the niche in which we find ourselves), why not embrace our own social virtues as valid and try to redefine the world in terms of them? This is Rorty’s argument for ethnocentricism; a position from which one “can give the notion such as ‘moral obligation’ a respectable, secular, non-transcendental sense by relativizing it to a historically contingent sense of moral identity.” And if this is a form of cultural relativism, so be it. Rorty does not fear relativism, since fear grows from the concern that there is nothing in the universe to hang onto except ourselves. This is his humanist point against the claim that reason transcends local opinion; there is only ourselves nested in the habits of action evolving over time into the current, contingent societal solidarities we find useful for achieving our purposes.

f. Philosophy as Metaphor

In line with Rorty’s nominalism is his idea of philosophy as metaphor. Once one abandons the search for truth and for a reality that is concealed behind the everyday world, the role of a social practice in the vanguard of cultural change and innovation (philosophical or otherwise) is, or ought to be, to liberate humanity from old metaphors that are rooted in superstition, mystification, and a religion-inspired mindset. He suggests that this can be done by offering new metaphors and reshaping vocabularies that will accommodate new, “abnormal” insights. In this function, philosophy will note the fears kindled by past practices as well as the hopes springing from the present, and reconcile them by avoiding ancient fallacies while projecting contemporary justified beliefs into the future. Key to this project is the acknowledgement that philosophical theories have tended to reify that which had been proposed in the past as useful metaphors. This cognitive “idolatry” is an outgrowth of the adoption of the correspondence theory of knowledge. Beginning with Plato’s use of perception to analogize the relation of the psyche to the Forms, philosophers have mistakenly tried to make a word-world connection in order to ground reality in thought. The trouble with this approach is that it causes one to look behind the vocabulary for a non-human entity or force which grounds its meaning in our consciousness. Rorty thinks that this representational scheme is wrongheaded because it confuses use for content. He holds that it is rather in the use of words that we come to grips with our ever-changing environment. Successful adaptation of metaphors to new conditions is more likely when one drops the expectation that words are made adequate by that environment, or a creative agency of that environment. It is left to humans to consciously fashion their own metaphors to cope with the world. Freed from the tyranny of locating and adopting a non-human vocabulary, human ingenuity and creativity will craft undreamt of possibilities as surely as Galileo reinvented our understanding of the “heavens” by jettisoning of the outmoded Aristotelian crystalline celestial metaphor, or as Thomas Kuhn reinvented our understanding of paradigms by recasting the Kantian idiom.

g. Anti-representational Metaphilosophy

Rorty’s anti-representationalism is closely associated with his anti-essential nominalism. While Rorty does not doubt that there is a reality that is recalcitrant to some (but not all) linguistic approaches (that is to say that not all attempts at constructing language-games prove useful to our local purposes work), he rejects that there can ever be a narrative that has a privileged viewpoint and/or has the final determination on “What there is.” Traditional Western Philosophy’s establishment of, alternately, rationalist, empiricist or transcendental worldviews to address the problem of depicting in words and ideas what is, in fact, does not so much outline a pattern of progress in expressing more adequate illustrations of reality; rather, it presents a history of the “idea idea” which Rorty holds as a red herring. Since the time of Plato, struggles over first principles have yielded academic debates that are seemingly endless attempts to characterize the world, but that are counterproductive to conversations aimed at changing the world. Rorty suggests that philosophers change the subject. Subject-changing is possible because there can be no common framework in which all minds participate. The possibility of different language-games offers a multitude of frameworks from which to choose, given Rorty’s anti-representational stance. No framework is more or less part of the fabric of the universe. Rather, dialogue ought to supersede certainty; interpretation to trump the search for truth. First-order philosophical search for a stable, final vocabulary that coherently captures the world in words or accurately corresponds to it drops out and is replaced with narrative-driven conversation. The plurality of interpretations that follows opens the way for an ever-evolving exchange concerning the function of proposed statements relative to a context; a series of pragmatic dialogues about what course of action is best fitted to a contemporary situation.

A special case stands out for Rorty’s anti-representationalist critique, that of scientism. Since the Enlightenment, objectivity via method has been the standard for scientific investigators. The systematic reading of the material world by those who are expert in the vocabulary of the sciences (that is, the quantification of observation statements) privileges these “rational” interpretations over all others. The assumption is that the universe is at its core a unified complex readily available for accurate and thorough analysis once one assumes the proper epistemological stance. And once taken that stance will build upon itself in an ever-increasing accumulation of objective knowledge. This optimistic progressivism is questioned by Rorty. Following Dewey’s dismissal of the dispassionate, autonomous knower of culturally neutral, objective knowledge, Rorty criticizes scientism’s image of the givenness of the world and the ability of scientists to discover the rational structures inherent in it. Viewing knowledge as an historical and cultural artifact, Rorty wishes to replace scientism’s systematic worldview with an “edifying” philosophy that treats science as just one among many non-privileged approaches, each of which projects sets of rules designed to bring about the well-being of a community. The choice of which of these approaches is most beneficial is the topic of the open-ended, interdisciplinary conversation favored by Rorty. Being free from teleological constraint, this sort of dialogue carries with it the expectation that convergent consensus is never possible; thus science cannot be the focal point of, or unique conduit for, an ever improving meeting of minds. Instead, Rorty considers all consensuses as contingent, partial, and on-going solidarities directed toward some specific practical outcome.

h. Pragmatic Pluralism

With no neutral ground from which to establish convergent consensus, all positions are competing ideas; presumed goods struggling for their existence. Thus, each is a live option until the practice is accepted by, or it is abandoned as non-workable for, a society. Appeals beyond the social environment have been eliminated by Rorty’s anti-foundational and anti-essential stances. Without a vocabulary that captures either the way the world is or a core human nature, there is never any possibility to locate a metaphysical foundation for truth. Equally unrealizable is a distinct epistemological platform from which to resolve differences between incongruent intuitions. Without transcendent or transpersonal standards, Liberal and Conservative narratives, atheist and fundamentalist ideologies, and realist and pragmatist approaches all vie equally for a cultural niche determining what works for a group at a given time. With everything unanchored and in flux, there is never a settled outcome, no final vocabulary that prevents the emergence of novel practices that threaten to eclipse the established ways of life. A plurality of metaphors thrives and in doing so upsets the settled, the canonical, the convergent consensus, keeping the conversation going. Rorty contends that it is the bruising competition among rival frameworks, including his own, that will result in a shakeout of the best framework fit for the times, around which will form a solidarity (albeit, contingently) of similarly-minded individuals. And the bounty of ideas, project, and programs will be surprisingly novel and astoundingly different.

i. Solidarities, Poets, and the Jeffersonian Strategy

The idea of a convergent consensus is built around the expectation that there is a grounding metaphysical standard “beyond” the flux of time, culture and circumstance, and that this standard has been the object of search for millennia. But to locate this standard, the seekers already must be at the consensus point which is being sought; they must already know what this is in order to find the real. Rorty considers this sort of Platonist reminiscence to be a vicious circle that assumes the consequent, i.e., that an objective point of view, in fact, exists. Even the Kantian attempt to circumvent this problem by asserting that we can have a priori knowledge of objects that we constitute ignores the troubling fact, according to Rorty, that Kant never explained how we have apodictic knowledge of the “constituting activities” of a transcendental ego. This attempt at self-foundation founders in another, more threatening way. In the placing of the “outer” into the “inner, constituting space,” the rational mind (seen as Reason itself) becomes the arbiter of cultural norms (“culture” being conceived as a collection of knowledge claims). Thus the discipline of philosophy becomes the keeper of the status quo, whose opinions and mode of thinking becomes the one true standard for any other discipline to measure itself against. However, Rorty emphatically denies that Philosophy as a discipline holds this crucial role. In fact, he argues that we should put aside the Kantian distinctions between disciplines as inegalitarian, and favor an open-mindedness based upon the Jeffersonian model of religious tolerance.

This Jeffersonian strategy, in line with Rorty’s historicist anti-foundationalism and anti-essentialist nominalism, is designed to encourage the abandonment of any claim of the discovery of an all-encompassing system of thought that serves as the legitimizer of all other practices. Seen as a remnant of the onto-theological period in human thinking, systematic philosophy suffers the same ills as traditional dogmatic theologies in that they both project as universal historically embedded, cultural values. The remedy that Rorty wishes to apply to this systematizing is to split public practices from private beliefs, treating all theories as narratives on par with each other, and to shelter edifying impulses toward poetic self-creativity from all pressures to conform. This dual strategy levels the playing field in the public sector, allowing unrestricted democratic dialogue between groups holding rival narratives (solidarities), while at the same time liberating creative thought from the normalizing restraints of the alleged privileged rationality asserted by Theological, Philosophical or Scientific solidarities. What is denied in Rorty’s Jeffersonian strategy is any universal commensuration in either the epistemological or metaphysical sphere, as well as the privilege of the rational in a supposed hierarchical system of reality. What is gained is the possibility for the expression of alternative, “abnormal” voices in the conversation of humankind, which, in potential, may prove to be persuasive enough to draw a growing number of adherents into its ranks, thereby creating a new solidarity better adapted to the contemporary environment, with its unique set of issues and requirements than are prior narratives. The evolution of unique narratives is progressive in the sense that each society and every era can discard encrusted customs and embrace novel practices that seem best in addressing the problems at hand. It is also contingent because there can be no final vocabulary that gets it right about human nature or the nature of existence. All is in play “all the way down” in an essence-less world where any foundational pretence to a harmony between the human subject and the objects of knowledge is eschewed, and where justification is confined to “beliefs that cannot swing free from the nonhuman environment.”

j. Non-reductive Materialism and the Self

Rorty sees the division between reductive materialism and subjectivism as a pseudo-problem originating with the Cartesian mind-body dualism. These incommensurate descriptions both pose as the sole truth on the subject of the nature of ontologically real objects. Wishing to “dedivinize” philosophy, science and discussions on the self, Rorty occasionally concentrates on the last of this troika in an effort to unsettle the western notion about an underlying substantial metaphysical center grounding existence. In his “Contingency of Selfhood,” Rorty defends contingencies and discontinuities of the “I” against realist thought. It is plausible that most Enlightenment thinkers could not fathom how inert matter and its motion could account for the first person experience of human consciousness. Rorty suggests that fear against the association of selfhood to the dying human animal may be a motivation for philosophers since Plato to posit a central essence for individuals. To this concern Rorty resorts to non-reductive materialism to explain away the mind-body issue that has concerned thoughtful people for the last four hundred years.

The use of descriptive vocabularies plays an important part in Rorty’s gloss on the human “self.” In his narrative, one vocabulary is centered on the description of physical objects and another is concerned with the discursive agent. The discursive agent may redescribe all objects, including him/herself, as subject in ever more “abnormal” terms without limits. Nevertheless, once a description is dedicated to a physicalist’s accounts of brain activity, it becomes incumbent upon the describing agent to note differences in human experience with a different vocabulary, vocabulary that does not assume the consequent concerning the alleged existence of the mind independent from the body. Rorty claims to do this by assigning parallel descriptions to both mind and brain without claiming that there is a center to either.

Whereas the brain can be redescribed as the continual reweaving of the electrical charges across the web of neural synapses, the mind can be redescribed as the constant reweaving of different beliefs and desires, redistributing truth values among the web of interlocking statements. Under Rorty’s description the brain is simply the amalgamation of synapses with no center, i.e., nothing that is independent of this agglomeration. Equally, Rorty holds that the mind is exactly a contingent network of beliefs and desires, having nothing at its core to which the bundled beliefs and desires adhere. It follows there is no self that has these mental elements, rather the self is these elements, and nothing more. Gone is the Cartesian tendency to reify the self and a material object as substantial in order to acknowledge that they each have causal effects. Gone is the mistaken idea of a self as an object represented to ourselves (for example, Descartes’ claim that he is a “thinking thing”). And gone also is the urge to completely separate the mental from the physical ontologically. There are two incommensurate descriptions of causal interaction. In this way, Rorty’s non-reductive materialist account of the self accords well with his nominalism, which rejects the sentence-fact dichotomy as firmly as his anti-essentialism rejects the subject-object split.

Of course, in keeping with Rorty’s narrative, there is no reason why one should limit the descriptions of the self, the mind, and the brain to Rorty’s vocabulary usage. If sometime in the future it serves the purpose of those who live at the time to redescribe Rorty’s account, say along strictly neuron-physiological lines that may accurately pair specific beliefs and desires to identifiable brain functions, then its utility would demand the adoption of this narrative. But until then, Rorty would argue for a holistic approach that does not seek a one-to-one identity between brain functions and mental occurrences, or a reduction of one to the other.

5. Critics

A philosophy that is controversial and iconoclastic as Richard Rorty’s is bound to have an abundance of critics. Space permits the consideration of only a few, those considered serious objections to his neopragmatism. Here is a representative sample of philosophers who pose challenges to key aspects of Rorty’s philosophy.

a. Hilary Putnam, John McDowell, and James Conant

Hilary Putnam doubts Rorty’s ability to sustain his claim to be a pragmatic realist. Turning to Rorty’s pivotal view of justification, Putnam, in Rorty and His Critics (Brandom: 2000), characterizes it as having two aspects: contextual and reforming. About the former, Putnam says that Rorty, by making justification a sociological matter, has apparently made a commitment to majority sentiment. Nevertheless, Putnam declares, by allowing that the majority can be wrong, Rorty is being either incoherent or illicitly introducing a standard that is independent of the social context. Knowing that Rorty rejects ahistorical foundations Putnam takes up the reformist aspect of Rortyan justification to see if Rorty can escape his apparent inconsistency. Rorty’s reformist position suggests that progress in talking and acting results not from being more adequate to some non-human (natural or transcendent) independent standard than one’s predecessors. Rather progress occurs because it seems to us to be clearly better. To this definition of progress Putnam responds that whether the outcome of some reform is deemed to be good or bad is logically independent from whether most people see it as a reform. Otherwise, the meaning of “progress” reduces to a subjective notion and “reform” to an arbitrary preference for a way of life. Therefore, the implication is that if we are to meaningfully use the terms “progress” and “reform,” there has to be better and worse non-subjective standards and norms. So it follows that there are non-sociological, objective ways to appreciate reality. Otherwise in a Rortyan anti-representationalist world of competing “stories” enabling one to cope or failing to help one cope with the “environment,” Rorty’s own narrative of redescriptions becomes one among many non-privileged, solipsistic perspectives, and thus loses its persuasive power.

James Conant and John McDonald complement Putnam’s position. James Conant argues that Rorty’s narrative, when taken to its logical conclusion ultimately undermines the tolerant, liberal, egalitarian society Rorty claims to value. Conant offers that a liberal democratic community must contain three internally-linked, non-transcendent concepts necessary for human voice: freedom, community, and truth. He argues that in the absence of this interlocking troika an alternative triad arises: the prevalence of solitude, uniformity, and an Orwellian doublethink. This latter threesome force upon those inculcated into such a social order barren conformity to meta-ideology that denies the very ability to reformulate language in ways that might threaten the veracity of that order. This is accomplished by relativizing truth; by reducing truth to the status of empty compliments and by utilizing cautionary doubt as a method by which each individual replaces inconvenient memories with group ‘justified’ assertions.

John McDowell refines Putnam’s position, by offering a distinction that actually makes Rorty, Putnam, and Kant allies! He attempts this difficult association by distinguishing the fear of a contingent life and the subsequent appeal to a Freudian father-like force that provides us iron-clad answers and norms to live up to from the desire to have us answerable to the way things are. McDowell suggests that Kant too wished to combat the denial of human finitude, and the consequent withdrawal from the contingent into the safety of an eternal realm, by claiming that appearance was not a barrier preventing us from gazing at reality objectively, but is the very reality we as rational human beings aspire to know. In this way McDowell thinks that Kant, admittedly anti-metaphysical, was as anti-priesthood as Dewey—extending the Protestant Reformation’s idiosyncratic connection to a non-human reality into Philosophy—and in line with Rorty’s anti-epistemology stance—that we are always ensconced within the human frame of reference. The upshot of McDowell’s distinction of objectivity from epistemic escapism is that even as we are located inextricably within a vocabulary there can be joined a unified discourse where the combination of a disquotational, descriptive use of the word "true" and the use of "true" that treats this term as a norm of inquiry is possible.

Conant builds Putnam’s and McDowell’s arguments for the ascendancy of objectivity (properly understood) over solidarity by linking Orwell’s “Newspeak” and Rorty’s New Pragmatism. Conant constructs his argument first by offering the non-controversial claim that freedom of belief is achievable only when one can decide for oneself concerning the facts in a community that nurtures this sort of freedom. This community can only be sustained when its norms of inquiry are not biased toward lock-step solidarity with one’s peers, but are geared toward the encouragement of independent attempts at relating one’s claims about the way things are with the way things are, in fact (or as Conant writes: ‘turning to the facts’). Real human freedom can be expressed when one is able to autonomously believe and to test one’s belief for its truth and falsity in a public forum unconstrained by sociological determinants. Freedom, Conant claims, is therefore a human capacity that emerges from the human condition and need not be attributable to any Realist thesis. Thus, Conant agrees with Rorty that there is nothing deep within us; there isn’t any indestructible nature or eternal substance. Nevertheless, a systematic effort to eliminate the vocabulary containing terms such as ‘eternal truths,’ ‘objective reality,’ and traits ‘essential to humanity’ would be akin to George Orwell’s Newspeak, in that such an elimination would render impossible human freedom by making it impossible to share in language such ideas and concepts. The very possibility of interpretive communication and dialogue among free thinkers engaged in the search for truth would be banished by the sort of control exerted over language that Rorty ironically insists is necessary to change vocabularies and to establish a liberal democratic utopia.

b. Donald Davidson and Bjorn Ramberg

Donald Davidson combines the theory of action with the theory of truth and meaning. For him an account of truth is simultaneously an account of agency and vice versa. By referring to “rationality,” “normativity,” “intentionality,” and “agency” as if they were co-extensive predicates, Davidson is able to claim that descriptions emerge as descriptions of any sort only against a taken-for-granted background of purposeful action. Agency—the ability to offer descriptions rather than merely make noise—only appears if a normative vocabulary is already in use. Normative behavior on the part of the communicators involved makes the case that the intentional stance is unlike the biological stance. In Rorty and His Critics, Davidson raises the “underdetermination/radical interpretation” issue, disputing Rorty’s long-held pragmatic claim that there is no significant philosophical difference between the psychological and the biological, as there is no significant difference between the biological and the chemical, once we abandon the idea of “adequacy to the world.”

Bjorn Ramberg, in support of Davidson’s contention in “Post-ontological Philosophy of Mind: Rorty Versus Davidson,” suggests that the linkage between mind and body is not the irreducibility of the intentional to the physical, but the understanding of the inescapability of the normative. Considering each other as persons with mutual obligations presupposes all pragmatic choices of descriptive vocabularies. We could never deploy some descriptive narrative unless we first deployed a normative vocabulary. As followers of norms, we cannot stop prescribing and just describe. Describing is part and parcel of a rule-governed conversation, an exchange conducted by people who talk to each other assuming the vocabulary of agency. Thus, members of a community are to be considered as interlocutors and not as “parametrics” (causal happenings). Rorty is correct in that there are many descriptive vocabularies (ways to bring salience to different causal patterns of the world) and many different communities of language-users. Yet, until recently, Rorty did not accept Davidson’s position that all individuals who engage others in descriptive language-use must speak prescriptively (see section 3e above), or that it is the inescapability of the vocabulary of normality (rather than the claims about the irreducibility of intentionality, rejected by Rorty) that marks off agency from biology. This leads directly to Davidson’s Doctrine of Triangulation. We are a plurality of agents (one corner of a triangle) each engaged in the project of describing to each other the “world” (a second corner), and interpreting each other’s descriptions of it (the third corner). As Ramberg writes:

We can while triangulating criticize any given claim about any description, we cannot ask for an agreement on the process of triangulation itself, for it would be another case of triangulation. The inescapability of norms is the inescapability—for both the describers and agents—of triangulation.

Davidson’s insight, as elucidated by Ramberg, has caused Rorty to revise his view that norms are set within solidarities alone. Rorty now holds that norms hover, so to speak, “over the whole process of triangulation.” While he still does not accept the positing of a second norm of factual reality as suggested by John McDowell, the emergent property of norms springing from dialogue cannot be reduced to, or identified with its biological (in a fashion similar to flocking, schooling, etc) or chemical (like H2O from hydrogen and oxygen, and so forth) counterparts.

c. Daniel Dennett

Daniel Dennett, in “Faith in the Truth” and “Postmodernism and Truth,” rejects postmodern critiques of physicalist science. Dennett’s target is relativism. Specifically, he charges that Rorty’s stance against the “chauvinism of scientism” leads to blurring the line between serious scientific debate and frivolous historicist exchanges that include science merely as one of many voices in the conversation of humankind. Thus, there is a danger in jettisoning “the matter of fact versus no matter of fact distinction.” What is lost is the ability to make true assertions about reality in terms other than the sociological. Dennett objects to the postmodern notion that what is true today—that leads us to assert, for example, that DNA is a double helix—may not be true tomorrow if the conversation shifts. Rather, he claims that there are actual justifications of what certain sociological facts obtain when it comes to the natural sciences (that is, that there is more agreement among scientists, that the scientific language-game is a better predictor of future events than other vocabularies, and so forth). To confirm our observations we must form good representations of reality. This is what allows these representations to be justified, beyond being good tools that lead to further coping strategies vis-à-vis nature. Otherwise, Rorty’s attitude—expressed as “give us the tools, make the moves, and then say whatever you please about their representational abilities. . . (f)or what you say will be, in the pejorative sense, ‘merely philosophical’”—dismisses scientific objectivity while aiding and abetting postmodern relativists who threaten to replace theory with jargon. Dennett considers writers holding such attitudes to be in “flatfooted ignorance of the proven methods of scientific truth-seeking and their power.”

d. Jurgen Habermas, Nancy Fraser, and Norman Geras

Jürgen Habermas writes in “Richard Rorty’s Pragmatic Turn,” “In forfeiting the binding power of its judgments, metaphysics also loses it substance.” With its loss philosophy can be rescued from its drift only by a post-metaphysics “metaphysics.” This is what Rorty is attempting to do. In his hands, philosophy must become more than academic; it must become relevant in a practical way. Recasting Heidegger in post-analytic terms, Rorty see the deflationary trends in contemporary philosophy as leading to its own negation if left unchecked by edifying creativity. It is a pattern that can lead to extinction if there is not new life breathed into old metaphors by restating them, stripped of their Platonic bias. Central to this bias, according to Habermas’ understanding of Rorty, is the Platonic distinction between “convincing” and “persuading.” Rorty wishes to replace the representational model of knowledge with a communication model that means to replace objectivity with successful intersubjective solidarity. But, Habermas contends that the vocabulary which Rorty employs blurs the line between participant and observer. By assimilating interpersonal relationships into adaptive, instrumental behaviors, Rorty cannot distinguish between the use of language directed towards successful actions and its use oriented toward achieving understanding. Without a conceptual marker to distinguish manipulation from argumentation, “between motivating through reason and causal exertion of influence, between learning and indoctrination,” Habermas concludes that Rorty’s project results in a loss of critical standards that make a real difference in our everyday practices.

Nancy Fraser provides in her “From Irony to Prophecy to Politics: A Response to Richard Rorty” a Habermasian case of Rorty’s difficulty in distinguishing between edification and indoctrination. While Fraser is sympathetic to Rorty’s anti-essentialist stance and his linguistic turn relative to politics and power, she has objected to his depiction of the process he suggests for the advancement of causes, Feminist or otherwise. In her response to Rorty’s “Feminism and Pragmatism,” Fraser rejects the notion advanced by Rorty that women must make a complete break with the memes that have been employed by males in Western cultures and redefine themselves out of whole cloth. The reason she gives for her objection is that the neo-Darwinian revolutionary vision that Rorty offers to Feminism is itself too embedded in the chauvinism of the past. Likening the suggested redefinition of memes to form a new feminist solidarity to the Oedipal struggle between a son and his father—manifested in the need for women to confront and overthrow those males who currently assert their semantic authority—Fraser dismisses Rorty’s zero-sum-game struggle over semantic space as one that replicates the male competitive model and does not easily fit into the psychological profile of pluralist, communal dialogue that contemporary feminists favor.

Furthermore, Fraser questions the notion of women forming solidarities, or as Rorty puts it “feminist clubs,” for the purpose of redefining themselves. She wonders which of the various definitions (for example, radical, liberal, Marxist, socialist, traditionalist, and so forth) will count as “taking the viewpoint of women as “women”? Would this not be an imposition of semantic authority by one elite, privileged “club” onto all other women? And would this not be a return to the Oedipal, confrontational style she is rejecting by inflaming the definitional differences among women along masculinist lines of class, sexual preference, and racial categories? Therefore, Fraser wants there to be a political movement along the lines of democratic socialism, where the various voices of women (and other feminists) move to create (and not discover or be assigned even in the most supportive terms) their own post-rationalist meanings, thus empowering women to speak for themselves, not as “prophets” but as themselves.

Similarly, Norman Geras takes exception to Rorty’s liberalism and his democracy of hope. Geras’s “Solidarity in the Conversation of Humanity (1995) is concerned with the possibility (more to the point, the impossibility) of a (Deweyan) humanism without any human nature. In this work, Geras refers to a lecture given by Rorty in the 1993 Oxford Amnesty series on “Human Rights”: the culture of human rights is, Rorty says, a “welcome fact of the post-Holocaust world”; it is “morally superior to other cultures.” Such affirmations, Geras notes, are part of the more general viewpoint Rorty recommends to western cultures: the viewpoint of liberalism without philosophical foundations, a pragmatically inspired hope for a tolerant and open democratic society on the basis of historical contingencies only. But in answering Geras’ rhetorical question “To whose morality is Rorty referring?” it seems, at first glance, that Rorty would answer that it is the solidarity of western liberal individuals’ values. Upon reflection, however, it would be a surprise if most of these liberals agreed with Rorty’s view on the denatured self and the ungroundedness of supporting humanitarian principles. Therefore, with principles being ad hoc adaptations of past ethnocentric norms and without the firm peg of a centered self upon which to hang his web of beliefs, Rorty has to be advancing his own idiosyncratic values. Furthermore, his values are packaged persuasively by the artful use of equivocations, allegedly as part and parcel of the human right’s culture based on a universalist notion of transcultural human integrity, notions that Rorty stoutly rejects. In short, Rorty’s reading of the human rights culture appropriates the notion of rights for his own anti-foundational, pragmatic ends: the command of semantic space of his view of humanity’s future. By doing so, Geras contends, in line with Habermas, there can be no clear distinction between the Rortyan democratic contribution to a dialogue on human ideals and a subtle insinuation of his idiosyncratic viewpoint into everyday practices making the world in his own image.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Rorty

  • Rorty, Richard, Ed., The Linguistic Turn: Essays in Philosophical Method. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1967.
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979.
  • Rorty, Richard. Consequences of Pragmatism. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
  • Rorty, Richard. Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Rorty, Richard. Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Rorty, Richard. On Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Rorty, Richard. Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Rorty, Richard. Achieving our Country: Leftists Thoughts in Twentieth-Century America. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1998.
  • Rorty, Richard. “McDowell, Davidson, and Spontaneity.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58: 2, (June, 1998): 389-394.
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and Social Hope. London: Penguin Books, 1999.
  • Rorty, Richard. Take Care of Freedom and Truth Will Take Care of Itself: Interviews with Richard Rorty. Ed., Edwuardo Mendieta. Stanford: Sanford University Press, 2006.

b. Works about Rorty

  • Brandom, Robert B., ed. Rorty and His Critics. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2000.
  • Calder, Gideon. Rorty and Redescription. London: Weidenfeld & Nicolson, 2003.
  • Geras, Norman. Solidarity in the Conversation of Humanity. London: Verso, 1995.
  • Goodman, Russell B., ed. Pragmatism: A Contemporary Reader. New York: Routledge, 1995.
  • Hall, David L. Richard Rorty: Prophet and Poet of the New Pragmatism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Malachowski, Alen, ed. Reading Rorty. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1990.
  • Murphy, John P. Pragmatism: From Peirce to Davidson. Boulder Colorado: Westview Press, 1990.
  • Saatkamp, Herman J., ed. Rorty & Pragmatism: The Philosopher Responds to His Critics. Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press, 1995.

c. Further Reading

  • Darwin, Charles. The Origin of the Species. New York: Random House, 1979.
  • Davidson, Donald. Inquiries Concerning Truth and Interpretation. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Dennett, Daniel. Consciousness Explained. New York: Little, Brown, 1991.
  • Dewey, John. The Quest for Certainty. New York: Capricorn Books, 1960.
  • Habermas, Jurgen. The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity. Tr., Frederick G. Lawrence. Cambridge, Massachusetts: The MIT Press, 1992.
  • Hegel, G. W. F. Phenomenology of Spirit. Tr., A. V. Miller. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. Translators John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson. New York: Harper & Row, 1962.
  • Kuhn, Thomas. The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1962.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Words and Life. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • Quine, Willard. V. O., Word and Object. Cambridge, Massachusetts: The MIT Press, 1960.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. Science, Perception and Reality. New York: Humanities Press, 1963.

Author Information

Edward Grippe
Email: EGrippe@ncc.commnet.edu
Norwalk Community College
U. S. A.

Jane Addams (1860—1935)

addamsJane Addams was an activist and prolific writer in the American Pragmatist tradition who became a nationally recognized leader of Progressivism in the United States as well as an internationally renowned peace advocate. Addams is primarily acclaimed for founding the Chicago social settlement, Hull-House, which emerged as the flagship of the Settlement Movement. Hull-House provided Addams with a supportive intellectual community and a basis for understanding urban life amidst rapid immigrant influx. Together with other Hull-House residents, Addams undertook a number of local, state, national and ultimately international activist projects including garbage collection, adult education, child labor reform, labor union support, women’s suffrage and peace advocacy among others. Her personal accomplishments are staggering and are recounted in a number of contemporary biographies. Addams helped to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People, the American Civil Liberties Union and the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. In 1931, she was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize.

Addams’ achievements as a social reformer represent a prodigious legacy but she also left a significant intellectual heritage. She authored a dozen books and over 500 articles of original social philosophy as recognized by her contemporaries including John Dewey, William James, and George Herbert Mead. The organizing principle of her social philosophy was progress. To this end, Addams understood democracy as both a form of socially engaged living and as a framework for social morality. Accordingly, authentic social advancement should be democratic or what she termed “lateral progress,” an inclusive advancement not just narrowly applied to the privileged. Addams argued that fostering the moral relations necessary for a robust democracy required community members to engage in “sympathetic knowledge,” an approach to learning about one another for the purpose of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Addams’ writings emphasize direct experience, pluralism and fallibility in the engagement with concrete social issues. Although the works of male philosophers such as Dewey, Peirce, James and Mead dominate the literature of classic American pragmatism, the writings of Jane Addams provide a unique and provocative feminist pragmatist voice.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Social Philosophy
    1. Sympathetic Knowledge
    2. Lateral Progress
    3. Pluralism
    4. Democracy
    5. Fallibilism
  3. Themes
    1. Peace
    2. Education
    3. Women’s Advancement
    4. Economics
  4. Philosophical Legacy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
      1. Books
      2. Selected Articles
      3. Collections
    2. Secondary Literature
    3. Biographies

1. Biography

Laura Jane Addams was born on September 6, 1860 in Cedarville, Illinois, ten months after the publication of Darwin’s Origin of The Species, two months prior to the election of Abraham Lincoln to the presidency of the United States and seven months prior to the secession of the South from the Union. Addams recounts her early life in Twenty Years at Hull-House, the only one of her works to continuously remain in print since it was first published in 1910. As a child she was called “Jennie” but her childhood had a turbulent beginning. When Jennie was two, her mother, Sarah, died whilst giving birth to her ninth child. As a result, Addams formed a significant bond with her father, John, who was a successful mill owner and politician. John Addams corresponded with Lincoln, and Jane Addams associated her father and Lincoln as moral icons and personal inspirations throughout her life. The relationship between John and his daughter was important because it afforded Jane the attention of an educated and worldly adult, an opportunity not experienced by many young women of this era. John Addams remarried but there was always a special bond between Jane and he.

John Addams sent his daughter to college at the Rockford Female Seminary (later Rockford College). Although Addams was always a good student, she blossomed in college and became a widely acknowledged campus leader. Addams learned how valuable a supportive female community could be given women’s exclusion from most activities in the public sphere. She later replicated the woman-centered atmosphere at Hull-House. When Addams graduated from college in 1881, she intended to pursue a medical career, but after a short tine in graduate school, she decided that medicine was not in her future. The death of her father in that same year placed her life in turmoil. Having lost direction in her life, she fell into a decade-long phase of soul searching, combined with sporadic health problems. During this period she undertook several trips to Europe. On her second trip, she encountered the pioneering social settlement, Toynbee Hall in London. Toynbee Hall provided young men an opportunity to work to improve the lives of impoverished Londoners. Soon after this encounter Addams developed a plan to start a social settlement in the United States.

Addams enlisted the help of her friend Ellen Gates Starr in her noble scheme. Starr had briefly attended Rockford College with Addams, so they shared an understanding of the empowerment that a female community could provide to its residents. Addams and Starr open the Hull-House settlement in 1889 in the heart of a run-down neighborhood on the west side of Chicago. They began with few plans, few resources and few residents but with a desire to be good neighbors to the community. Working with the network of women’s organizations in Chicago, the number of Hull-House projects quickly grew, as did their reputation. Women, and to a lesser extent men, came from all over the country to live and work as part of this progressive experiment in communal living combined with social activism. Under Addams’ leadership, Hull-House opened a public bathhouse, undertook a campaign to have the garbage collected, started a kindergarten, developed the first playground in Chicago and responded to a variety of community needs. At first, Addams had rented the entire second floor and the first floor drawing room of the Hull-House building but eventually the settlement complex grew to accommodate one full city block. Addams faced an ongoing challenge to explain the work Hull-House had undertaken. People often felt compelled to give settlement projects the familiar label of charity work, but Addams rebuffed this claim. As she explained in her 1893 article, “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement,” Addams viewed Hull-House residents as engaged in reciprocal knowledge work: the collection, analysis and dissemination of information combined with intelligent action.

Addams was an effective activist and organizer but she was also keenly attuned to social theory. As a child she had read widely, largely influenced by her father who housed the town library in their home. At Rockford, she was exposed to Ancient Greek philosophy as well as the social theories of the Romantics, John Ruskin and Thomas Carlyle. At Hull-House, Addams attracted the attention of John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, each of whom visited and engaged Addams in lively conversations that proved to be mutually influencing. Given this intellectual foundation, Addams used her Hull-House experience as a springboard for developing public philosophy in the American Pragmatist Tradition. In 1899, ten years after founding Hull-House, Addams published, “The Function of the Social Settlement” in which she placed her progressive activities in epistemological terms. Addams viewed issues of knowledge as the most profound contemporary challenge. Social settlements were an active effort to learn about one another across class and cultural divides thus building collective knowledge about the individuals who make up this diverse society. In this manner, Hull-House served as a multi-directional conduit of information about human lives: Addams and her cohorts helped immigrants learn how to navigate the complex American culture while Addams communicated and thematized her experience with immigrants to help white, upper and middle class America understand what it meant to be poor and displaced. Furthermore, Addams viewed this knowledge creation as reciprocal: society benefited from the knowledge that immigrants brought and the immigrants benefited from learning about their new neighbors. Addams was unique in recognizing that immigrants could contribute to American culture.

Addams authored or co-authored a dozen books and over 500 articles after she founded Hull-House. The articles appeared in both scholarly and popular periodicals, establishing Addams as a public philosopher and social leader. Addams was also a much in-demand speaker and she traveled nationally and internationally to make presentations that supported her progressive values. Addams was one of the few women of the era to transgress the private sphere to successfully influence the public sphere. Polls indicate that Addams became one of the most recognized and admired figures in the United States. She was an influential catalyst for change, lending her name and organizing skills to a variety of causes. Addams worked with W.E.B. DuBois in support of a number of African-American endeavors including writing articles for his publication The Crisis and helping to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People. She helped start the American Civil Liberties Union and organized the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. Her tireless effort in support of peace led to Addams receiving the 1931 Nobel Peace prize. Addams died of cancer on May 21, 1935. The public memorial at Hull-House filled the streets with mourners and eulogies were published in newspapers nationally and internationally.

2. Social Philosophy

There are a number of reasons why Addams was not generally recognized as a philosopher until the late twentieth century which include her gender and her association with social work. Another factor in this lack of recognition is that she was not a systematic philosopher either stylistically or methodologically. Addams’ writing style is not typical of the philosophic tradition in that it lacks a sustained abstract character. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, arguably the most philosophical of Addams’ books, the chapters address charity workers, family relationships, domestic workers, industrial working conditions, educational methods and political reforms. To the trained philosopher, these topics appear far removed from more familiar considerations of epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. However, a careful examination of her work reveals that Addams begins with social phenomena and draws theoretical inference from these experiences. In Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams offers intriguing, even radical, insights into the nature of ethics and epistemology. To read Addams as a philosopher requires setting aside assumptions about beginning from abstract theoretical positions. As a pragmatist, Addams is strictly interested in social philosophy. Everything she writes seeks what James would refer to as the “cash value” of an idea for social growth and improvement. Four interrelated cornerstones of her social philosophy are the concepts of sympathetic knowledge, lateral progress, pluralism and fallibilism.

a. Sympathetic Knowledge

Beginning with her first book, Democracy and Social Ethics and running through all of her works addressing social issues is the notion of sympathetic knowledge. Fundamentally, sympathetic knowledge is the idea that humans can learn about one another in terms that move beyond propositional knowledge, that is rather than merely learning facts, knowledge is gained through openness to disruptive knowledge. Knowledge can be disruptive in the sense that new information can transform one’s perceived experience and understanding. This idea motivated Addams and the residents of Hull-House to undertake the first urban study of racial demographics, which was published as Hull-House Maps and Papers in 1895. Addams integrated epistemological inquiry with ethical analysis such that it was the responsibility of members of a society to know one another better for the purposes of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Sympathetic knowledge is Addams’ rationale behind social settlements. By providing a physical location where people of different backgrounds could meet, social knowledge is built up reducing the abstraction of distant others transforming them into concrete, known others. Accordingly, Addams suggests that the many social activities sponsored by Hull-House—clubs, dances, performances, athletics—were not frivolous affairs but a means for breaking down barriers between people, thus fostering sympathetic knowledge. In Twenty Years at Hull-House and later in The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams claims that these social activities performed an educative function and that social settlements were in fact thoroughly educative projects. Like Dewey, Addams valued education as the foundation of a healthy democratic society. Like Mead, Addams viewed “play” as an essential aspect of education because of its ability to fire the imagination. Addams takes this notion so far as to argue that play is important for a vibrant democracy because it creates the possibility of empathetic imagination. When one plays, one takes on the roles of others and through fictitious inhabitation of these positions begins to empathize with the plight of others. In this manner, education also contributes to sympathetic knowledge. Similarly, literature and drama can enhance sympathetic knowledge as one empathizes with fictitious characters. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored community theater as well as the reading of novels.

The basis of sympathetic knowledge is experience that is imaginatively extrapolated. When Addams addresses prostitution in A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil, she employs anecdotes from the Hull-House community to allow her audience to understand the struggles of young women in the big cities. In this manner, she is neither strictly deontological nor teleological in her moral approach. Rather than dealing with principles of sexuality, for example, or the consequences of prostitution on society, although both considerations are important, Addams begins by attempting to increase knowledge of marginalized women. Inherent in this approach to human ontology is a belief in the fundamental goodness and relationality of people. Addams believes that if her audience understands what is going on in the lives of others, even if those others are outcasts, then we may begin to care and possibly take positive action on their behalf. Addams’ method of sympathetic knowledge extends to those with whom she disagreed. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams describes her failed political battles with local ward alderman, Johnny Powers (who Addams does not name in print). Hull-House sponsored a number of unsuccessful attempts to unseat Powers. Rather than excoriate Powers for his backroom deals and bribery, Addams set out to understand what made such an alderman popular. Through this method of inquiry, Addams, although not altering her denunciation of Powers’ cronyism, began to understand how the people of the ward appreciated an alderman who was visible and connected to their everyday lives. For Addams, sympathetic knowledge, despite its emotive implications, was a rational attempt to understand others. Accordingly, Addams eschewed antagonism. Ad hominem attacks only foster defensive barriers so Addams employed sympathetic knowledge in what she described as a detached manner. Such an approach might seem counter intuitive, but is understandable for a figure like Addams who bridged the reserved nature of the Victorian era and the moral commitment of the Progressive era.

b. Lateral Progress

Given her status as one of the leading figures of the progressive era, it is not surprising that Addams advocated social progress, but she distinguished the particular type of progress she advocated. The industrial revolution had seen many people prosper in the name of economic and technological progress. In addition, Addams had grown up in the post-Civil War era where social progress had been attributed to the newfound rights of African-Americans. Addams, however, viewed such progress to be more abstract than concrete. In the case of economic progress, it was experienced mostly by an elite few with some benefits trickling down to the middle class. From her perspective at Hull-House, she witnessed the inability of immigrants to fully participate in the economy or the political process. Similarly, she saw that although African-Americans ostensibly had legal rights, they often were prevented from actualizing those rights through a combination of laws intended to circumvent equality and racism in social relations. Given these experiences, Addams advocated what she referred to as “lateral progress,” or the idea that for authentic progress to take place, it would have to be experienced in a widespread manner rather than by a privileged few. Furthermore, Addams’ notion of lateral progress was not to be enforced hierarchically from structures of authority. Addams envisioned a progress that was derived from participatory democratic processes.

Addams applied the concept of lateral progress to a number of social issues. When it came to women’s suffrage, for example, Addams did not base her arguments upon principles of equality or fairness. Instead, she argued that such a move represented lateral progress, the inclusion of all—including women—would lead to the betterment of society. Similarly, her support of labor unions was tempered by the notion of lateral progress. Addams did not advocate for collective bargaining merely to benefit those fortunate enough to be in the unions; she viewed labor unions as working toward lateral progress by improving wages, hours and working conditions for all workers.

c. Pluralism

Addams argued for the inclusion of all members of society in the institution, policies and practices that were to lead to social progress. For example, in a 1930 article, “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment” Addams contends that pluralism has an energizing impact on society and should be embraced rather than feared. In this manner, Addams was an early American theorist who saw the value of diversity. Addams suggested that by bringing their cultural heritage to the United States, immigrants kept America from becoming static. Reciprocally, immigrants benefited from engaging in the cultural heritage found in North America. For Addams, social progress demanded that all voices be heard but she believed in the power of collective intelligence to find common cause from that diversity.

Addams’ valorization of cultural diversity was so thoroughgoing that she integrated it into her pacifist arguments. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams contends that cosmopolitan cities are a model for international peace. While not romanticizing the conflicts between groups that occur in the city, Addams draws on numerous experiences of people from different cultural heritages setting aside their differences to develop working relationships and help one another survive the challenges of urban life. Addams believed that if diverse people under the strain of Chicago’s urban blight could find a way to work together, then countries in the international community could also come to some equilibrium without violence.

Addams applied her pluralistic commitment to intellectual understanding. Hull-House welcomed speakers from a variety of political positions, whether the residents agreed with those positions or not. To foster this openness, Addams eschewed ideological ties for herself and for the Hull-House community. In this manner, although she was sympathetic to many of the arguments of socialists, anarchists, feminists and various Christian leaders, she never entirely accepted any ideological position. Demonstrating her pragmatism, she avoided political labels but variously aligned herself when it meant advancing the cause of social progress. On many occasions, Addams and Hull-House were criticized for not clearly associating themselves with an ideological camp.

d. Democracy

Addams maintained a robust definition of democracy that moved far beyond understanding it merely as a political structure. For Addams, democracy represented both a mode of living and a social morality. She viewed democracy as an acknowledgement that the lives of citizens are bound up with one another and this relationship creates a duty to understand the struggles and circumstances of fellow citizens. Reciprocity of social relations is crucial for providing citizens with the empathetic foundation necessary to energize democracy. Social settlements were experiments in the kind of democracy that Addams endeavored to promote: one of active social engagement. Addams’ definition of democracy becomes clearest in Democracy and Social Ethics where she makes two equivalencies clear. One, moral theory in the modern age must emphasize social ethics. Two, for Addams, democracy is social ethics.

Addams metaphorically described democracy as a dynamic organism that must grow with changing times in order to remain vital. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams goes so far as to suggest that it was time that the United States’ political institutions and morality progressed. She argued that America’s founders, whom she admired, developed the Bill of Rights based upon an individual sense of morality appropriate for their era. However, Addams viewed social morality as the appropriate response to the contemporary rise of big cities along with the improvements in technology and transportation that brought so many people together. The time had come to emphasize the social relations necessary for a vibrant democracy under the current historical circumstances. Some commentators describe Addams as advocating a “social democracy,” one that emphasizes a way of being over the political structure. Addams’ valorization of democracy did not entail a static object of affection. She wanted democracy to grow and flourish which required ongoing conversation and change. In this manner, Addams never conflated her love of democracy with unabashed patriotism. Also in Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams develops the notion of “cosmic patriotism,” arguing that one’s commitment to humanity must exceed national borders.

e. Fallibilism

Another aspect of Addams’ work that differentiates it from traditional philosophic literature is its humility. Employing the experimental method of American Pragmatists, Addams described numerous ventures undertaken by the Hull-House community in the name of fostering sympathetic knowledge or lateral progress. However, Addams was not afraid to recount her errors in these efforts. For Addams, mistakes are opportunities for growth and are worth the risk of active engagement. In the process of crossing class and cultural boundaries—moving from the familiar to the unfamiliar—there are bound to be mistakes made, but if they are done in the spirit of care and with humility, then the errors are not insurmountable and have the potential to be great teachers. Time and again, the upper class, college-educated, white women who predominated the Hull-House community demonstrated their lack of cultural sensitivity only to provide Addams with an anecdote for further social analysis and an opportunity to learn from the errors. Mistakes were merely part of the pragmatist cycle of action and reflection.

Twenty Years at Hull-House recounts many of Addams’ mistakes. For example, when Starr and Addams first established the settlement, they furnished Hull-House with the trappings of the high culture with which they were familiar. Addams later regretted this approach and recognized the class alienation that fine furniture, draperies and artwork foster. She later has these items removed for simpler furnishings. In another anecdote from Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams oversees the construction of a coffee house at Hull-House to provide working immigrants with a place to purchase nutritious food without the temptation of alcohol, as was available at local saloons. Despite bringing in modern equipment and using the latest techniques in economical and healthy food production, the coffee house proved unpopular, even with Hull-House residents. Addams came to realize that their paternalism had prevailed, once again alienating their community. Eventually, they made adjustments in the menu to local tastes and the coffee house became another successful part of the Hull-House complex, although more for its contribution to socializing than the cuisine it provided. What is interesting about these anecdotes is that Addams does not attempt to hide or put a positive spin on them. Out of sensitivity for misrepresenting the interests and positions of her neighbors, Addams describes the practice of bringing Hull-House neighbors to her presentations so that she would not be viewed simply as the outside expert attesting to her findings. In this way, mistakes served to improve her practices.

3. Themes

Addams’ pragmatist philosophy integrated experience with theory in an ongoing and dynamic dance that makes it inappropriate to separate her theories from the social issues in which she engaged. This is part of the reason that Addams’ work appears alien to those steeped in the Western tradition of philosophy, which attempts to lay claim to universal truths. Addams makes use of what feminist philosophers have described as “standpoint epistemology,” acknowledging that her philosophy is derived from a particular social, political and historical position. Her theoretical work flowed from working out tangible social issues of her day, and yet many of her themes and conclusions remain relevant for the present.

a. Peace

Perhaps no other issue took more of Addams’ time and attention in the latter part of her public career than did peace. Besides dozens of articles, she authored two books, Newer Ideals of Peace and Peace and Bread in Time of War, she also co-authored Women at The Hague, all books that directly address issues of peace. In addition, many of her other books such as The Long Road of Women’s Memory, The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, and My Friend, Julia Lathrop have at least a chapter dedicated to issues of peace. While Addams avoided ideological positions, she came closest when it came to pacifism. Nevertheless, she never invoked a universal principle such as declaring all war as immoral, however she did contend that violent conflict was regressive, wasteful and provided the possibility of further violence in society.

In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams made it clear that she saw peace as more than the absence of war. For Addams, peace represented an opportunity for social progress because people were capable of working together to achieve social goals. Like many in the late nineteenth century, Addams viewed social evolution as progressing toward greater peaceful relations and social harmony. Collective peace was tied to individual peaceful relations such that communal activism represented peace efforts. For example, helping immigrants thrive in the United States was an act of peace. In this manner, given her commitment to democratic social progress achieved through collective engagement in an effort to foster sympathetic knowledge, Addams extrapolated that war is socially regressive. Armed conflict ends rational and dispassionate conversations impeding the agreement necessary for social growth. War makes opposing human beings into ultimate others—someone so alien that it is possible to kill them—creating the antithesis of sympathetic knowledge.

Addams resisted compartmentalizing her moral philosophy, and she extended this to her ideas about peace. Rather than merely offering a direct normative assessment of militarism, Addams casts a wider net to address variables less causally related to a particular conflict. In “Democracy or Militarism,” written in the context of the Spanish-American War, Addams indicates that society is at a crossroads. According to Addams, to accept militaristic actions as a part of international politics is to normalize brutalization that makes further violence acceptable. To support her claim, she cites instances of increased social violence that can be tied, albeit loosely, to the formal acceptance of war. Furthermore, Addams identifies the gender dimension of increased militarism. In “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions,” Addams resists traditional notions of chivalry and romanticism to claim that the ostensible argument for the violent protection of women can only lead women to a vulnerable position in a society where violence is normalized.

Addams was not merely a social critic. Her social philosophy often included alternative plans of action—not fixed solutions but flexible and revisable outcomes. Addams, like William James, suggests that militarism has been ennobled in cultural traditions and that an ennobling substitute was needed to fire the same kind of dedication. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams offers social activism as the cause that should be rallied around. Addams challenges her readers to imagine heroism in the work of social activists to improve urban life.

Her staunch philosophy of pacifism brought Addams a great amount of personal criticism during her public career. Although many of her contemporaries, like Dewey, would support the United States’ entry into World War I, Addams did not. Her popularity suffered greatly and she faced some of her harshest rebukes as national emotions peaked prior to the onset of war. More significantly, World War I signaled a changing tide for progressivism. Political realism came to the fore, and Addams’ ideals of peace suddenly became culturally archaic. The post World War I period saw the number of social settlements dwindle and American Pragmatism experienced an extended hibernation.

b. Education

Addams viewed lifelong education as a critical component of an engaged citizenry in a vibrant democracy. To that end, Hull-House sponsored a myriad of educational projects. Addams strived to improve childhood education by working for legislation to reduce child labor, she sponsored a kindergarten at Hull-House and worked with Dewey and education pioneer Ella Flagg Young on pedagogical techniques centered upon making education more relevant for students. Extant descriptions by visitors to Hull-house describe it as permeated by children furiously involved in a myriad of activities.

In the early twentieth century, adolescence was a largely overlooked period of human development and on the occasions when young adulthood was addressed at all, it was usually conceived of as a problem. Addams, who often directed her philosophical analysis to marginalized sectors of society, took a particular interest in adolescence. In what she described as her favorite book, The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets, Addams offers an extended study of the plight of young people and through her Hull-House experiences explains to her readers the needs and challenges of this age. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored a number of programs for adolescents including social gatherings, athletics and drama. Hull-House engaged in pioneering programs for young women’s sports and physical activity, defying social norms that claimed that exercise was inappropriate for women.

Addams’ commitment to lifelong education resulted in pioneering work in adult education. Hull-House sponsored college extension courses as well as a variety of educational opportunities for adults in the community including lectures and clubs. For example, The Plato Club offered weekly readings and discussions on philosophy, where Dewey sometimes lectured, and The Working People Social Science Club provided an opportunity for discussions of social and political philosophy. Some commentators have claimed that Hull-House was the birthplace of adult education. In The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams describes developing particular pedagogical techniques adapted for adult students including the need for a peer-level social atmosphere and the use of news events as an opportunity for learning.

c. Women’s Advancement

Addams eschewed ideological labels including that of feminist, nevertheless she was clearly aligned with the feminist movement. She advocated for women’s suffrage and took a leadership role as the Vice-President of the National American Woman Suffrage Association from 1911-1914. Consistent with her notion of lateral progress, Addams’ support for women’s advancement was framed in terms of social progress rather than principles of equality or merely advocating for an oppressed constituency. Addams contended that women brought an alternative perspective to politics and given her commitment to pluralism, alternative perspectives could only strengthen society. For example, in “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise,” Addams parodies the plight of women by commenting on men’s foibles in a manner that mimicked the way men spoke of the reasons women should not be given elective franchise. She accused men of being quarrelsome as well as exhibiting misplaced values in preferring to spend money on armaments than on domestic welfare. Accordingly, Addams is sometimes accused of being a gender essentialist in the language she employed about the nature of men and women.

Addams undertook numerous projects with the empowerment of women as a goal. Hull-House itself was a unique woman-centered project. There were male residents but it was always clear that the leadership and culture of Hull-House were decidedly female. Hull-House supported immigrant mothers in their roles as primary care givers and even took the radical step of disseminating birth control information. One example of Addams’ concern for women can be seen in the creation of the Jane Club, described inTwenty Years at Hull-House. At a time when collective bargaining did not enjoy the legal protections that it does today, Addams observed that women labor union members were particularly vulnerable when it came to periods of unemployment created by strikes or lockouts. When such actions took place, single women could no longer afford rent money. This vulnerability reduced the power of the bargaining unit. Working with women labor leaders such as Mary Kenney, Addams established a workingwoman’s cooperative named the Jane Club. This cooperative ensured that all members’ rent was paid in the event of labor interruptions. Addams eventually secured funding to build housing for the Jane Club but it operated as an independent entity.

Given their commitments to pluralism, classical American philosophers have been generally more sympathetic to the plight of women than many other genres of philosophers, but Addams further sensitized their thought. Contemporary philosopher Charlene Haddock Seigfried coined the term “pragmatist feminism” to describe the fruitful intersection of American philosophy and feminist theory. Seigfried’s quintessential example of a pragmatist feminist was Jane Addams.

d. Economics

Although Addams did not write a book-length work on economics, comment on economic issues permeates her writings. Addams had much in common with socialist analysis, which was particularly popular in this rocky period of American economics. She knew and supported Eugene Debs, and engaged a number of socialist intellectuals in discussions. Given her pursuit of lateral progress, her affinity for socialism is understandable, but Addams’ aversion to antagonism did not allow her to accept the social upheaval espoused in much of the socialist rhetoric. Addams’ support of labor unions exemplified her socialistic leanings. In the formative years of labor organizing, there was a widespread belief that collective bargaining was a mediating step toward a social transformation where eventually greater control of the means of production would be gained by laborers. Addams viewed the amelioration of class differences as representing social progress and therefore supported unionization.

As a result of the Pullman Strike of 1894, Addams became involved in issues of union management relations. Although it was only five years after the opening of Hull-House, Addams had already garnered a public reputation for skilled negotiating and was enlisted to engage in mediation between railroad car workers and George Pullman, the staunch patriarch of the Pullman Palace Car Company and one of the richest men in America. Addams ultimately played a negligible role in the strike because Pullman refused to meet with her. The labor negotiation foundered and the strike ended quickly and painfully for the workers. Addams’ most important contribution was in constructing the legacy of the Pullman strike. Addams penned an eloquent and reflective account of the strike, “A Modern Lear,” in which she compared George Pullman to Shakespeare’s tragic figure, King Lear. It took nearly twenty years for “A Modern Lear” to be printed, as publishers shunned Addams’ critical analysis. Utilizing a process of sympathetic knowledge, Addams does not describe clear-cut heroes and villains in the Pullman strike, but characterizes Pullman as disconnected from his workers, much like King Lear was alienated from his daughter. For Addams, this illustrated the danger of capitalism, that economic barriers isolated people from one another. In a philosophy advocating an engaged society, such barriers retarded progress.

4. Philosophical Legacy

Although Addams has not always been included in the canon of classical American philosophy, her contemporaries, including John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, publicly acknowledged Addams’ influence on their thinking. Therefore, in addition to her own corpus of work, Addams’ intellectual legacy can be found in their philosophy. Nevertheless, for much of the twentieth century, Addams was considered unoriginal and her writing was thought to be derivative of other thinkers. In the 1990’s, a renewed interest in Addams’ theoretical work developed from the feminist practice of revisiting historical boundaries that traditionally limited philosophical qualification. At the turn of the twenty-first century, Addams’ major works have come back in to print and a number of intellectual biographies have reconsidered Addams’ intellectual legacy.

In many ways, Addams took American pragmatism to a logical conclusion: social action. Pragmatists emphasize the dynamic relationship of experience and theory in the service of social advancement. Dewey, James and Mead engaged in social projects from university settings. Addams, who never had an official university appointment, although she did teach occasionally at the University of Chicago, took pragmatist theory out into society and applied it to her projects. However, in the process, she never stopped writing and thematizing her experiences, thus revising and reconsidering her theories. In this manner Addams provides one model of what it is to be a public philosopher.

5. References and Further Reading

a Primary Literature

i. Books

  • Addams, Jane. Democracy and Social Ethics. 1902. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Addams’ most recognizable philosophical work. Of particular importance is the Introduction where she sets forth her concept of sympathetic knowledge.
  • Addams, Jane. Newer Ideals of Peace, New York: Macmillan, 1906. Addams extends the concept of peace to more than the absence of war.
  • Addams, Jane. The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets. 1909. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1972. Addams breaks new ground by addressing the overlooked age of adolescence and describes youth in positive terms rather than the negative terms typical of the era.
  • Addams, Jane. Twenty Years at Hull House. 1910. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1990. Best work to start a study of Addams. Opening chapters are autobiographical and then the book addresses the first two decades of the Hull-House community.
  • Addams, Jane. A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil. 1912. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Addams addresses prostitution using a pragmatist approach that incorporates an analysis of many variables.
  • Addams, Jane. The Long Road of Woman’s Memory. 1916. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Once again focusing upon a marginalized social group, Addams explores the depth of the memories of elderly immigrant women. Includes the intriguing story of the Devil Baby.
  • Addams, Jane. Peace and Bread in Time of War. 1922. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Written after World War I, this work is less optimistic than Newer Ideal of Peace but addresses issues of patriotism and dissent in time of war.
  • Addams, Jane. Second Twenty Years at Hull House. New York: Macmillan, 1930. Addams addresses a variety of topics related to projects at Hull-House.
  • Addams, Jane. The Excellent Becomes the Permanent. New York: Macmillan, 1932. A unique text where Addams eulogizes twelve people including herself. Addams concludes by addressing issues of art, imagination, and memory.
  • Addams, Jane. My Friend, Julia Lathrop. 1935. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004. Her last book-length work, Addams provides a biography of long time Hull-House resident, Julia Lathrop who went on to be the first woman head of a Federal agency (The Women’s Bureau). Although a biography of someone else, this work reveals a great deal about Addams’ values and philosophy.
  • Addams, Jane, Emily G. Balch and Alice Hamilton. Women at The Hague: The International Congress Of Women And Its Results.1915. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2003. Addams authors two chapters of this intriguing historical account of women organizing to prevent war and offer a means for lasting world peace.
  • Residents of Hull-House. Hull-House Maps and Papers. 1895. New York: Arno Press, Inc., 1970. Groundbreaking study of urban life and demographics in Chicago, which had witnessed an unprecedented influx of migrants from Western and Eastern Europe.

ii. Selected Articles

  • Addams, Jane. “Democracy or Militarism.” 1899. Central Anti-Imperialist League of Chicago, Liberty Tract I.
  • Addams, Jane. “A Function of the Social Settlement.” 1899. Reprinted in Christopher Lasch, Ed. The Social Thought of Jane Addams. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc., 1965.
  • Addams, Jane. “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise.” 1913. Reprinted in Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “A Modern Lear.” 1912. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement.” 1893. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “The Subjective Necessity for Social Settlements.” 1893. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions.” 1916. Reprinted in Jane Addams on Peace, War, and International Understanding 1899-1932, ed., Allen F. Davis (New York: Garland Publishing, 1976), 135.
  • Addams, Jane. “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment.” 1930. Journal of Adult Education II, no. 3 (June).

iii. Collections

  • Bryan, Mary Lynn McCree, Barbara Bair, and Maree De Angury. Eds., The Selected Papers of Jane Addams Volume 1: Preparing to Lead, 1860-1881. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2003.
  • Condliffe Lagemann, Ellen. Ed., Jane Addams On Education. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 1994.
  • Cooper Johnson, Emily. Ed., Jane Addams: A Centennial Reader. New York: Macmillan, 1960.
  • Davis, Allen F. Ed., Jane Addams on Peace, War, and International Understanding. New York: Garland Publishing, Inc., 1976.
  • Elshtain, Jean Bethke. Ed., The Jane Addams Reader. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Lasch, Christopher. Ed., The Social Thought of Jane Addams. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company Inc., 1965.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Deegan, Mary Jo. Jane Addams and the Men of the Chicago School, 1892-1918. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Books, 1988. Through numerous articles and books, Deegan has spearheaded an effort to have Addams recognized as one of the most important American sociologists.
  • Fischer, Marilyn. On Addams. Wadsworth, 2004. The most concise review of Addams’ philosophy. A handy companion volume to Addams’ writings.
  • Hamington, Maurice. Embodied Care: Jane Addams, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Feminist Ethics. Urbana, Il: University of Illinois Press, 2004. Addams’ work conceived as contributing to feminist care ethics.
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996. Seigfried suggests that pragmatism and feminism have much in common and can benefit from further integration. Addams exemplifies a pragmatist feminist position.

c. Biographies

  • Brown, Victoria Bissell. The Education of Jane Addams. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press, 2004.
  • Davis, Allen F. American Heroine: The Life and Legend of Jane Addams. London: Oxford, 1973.
  • Diliberto, Gioia. A Useful Woman: The Early Life of Jane Addams. New York: Scribner, 1999.
  • Elshtain, Jean Bethke. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Farrell, John C. Beloved Lady: A History of Jane Addams’ Ideas on Reform and Peace. Baltimore: The John Hopkins Press, 1967.
  • Joslin, Katherine, Jane Addams: A Writer’s Life. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004.
  • Knight, Louise, Citizen: Jane Addams and the Struggle for Democracy. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2005.
  • Linn, James Weber. Jane Addams: A Biography. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2000.

Author Information

Maurice Hamington
Email: hamington@earthlink.net
Lane Community College
U. S. A.

George Santayana (1863—1952)

santayanGeorge Santayana was an influential 20th century American thinker whose philosophy connected a rich diversity of historical perspectives, culminating in a unique and unrivaled form of materialism, one recommending a bold reconciliation of spirit and nature. Santayana was also a poet, and he wrote a work of fiction, The Last Puritan, that was a Book of the Month Club selection in 1936, the same year he adorned the cover of Time magazine. Though he spent his formative intellectual life in America and ultimately is best categorized philosophically in that tradition, Santayana spent the better part of his life and publishing career in Europe. He spent his early childhood in his birth-country of Spain and throughout his expansive travels and residencies never relinquished his native citizenship. Displaying in both composition and criticism a prodigious literary imagination, Santayana’s writings appealed to a wide audience, and he remains to this day one of the most quoted of twentieth century thinkers. Probably the most well-known sentence of Santayana’s is also one of the least accurately quoted: “Those who cannot remember the past are condemned to repeat it” (The Life of Reason: Reason in Common Sense. Scribner’s, 1905: 284). Scholarly interest in Santayana today remains modest but diverse. Santayana was a thinker of rare stature whose work deserves the highest compliment of all: it can and may well still be read millennia from now.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Philosophy
    1. Ontology and Epiphenomenalism
    2. Realms and Terminology
    3. Realms Defined
  4. Naturalism in World Perspective
  5. Legacy
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. MIT Press Critical Editions
    2. Other Santayana Works
    3. Books About Santayana

1. Life

George Santayana was born on December 16, 1863 in Madrid, Spain. He lived his first eight years in Spain, his next forty years in Boston, and his last forty years in Europe. Accordingly, Santayana arranged his life in his autobiography, Persons and Places, in three parts: (1) “Background,” (2) “On Both Sides of the Atlantic,” and (3) “All on One Side.” The Background (1863-1886) encompassed his childhood in Ávila, Spain, through his undergraduate years at Harvard. The second period, during which Santayana traveled between the U.S. and Europe, covered his Harvard years (1886-1912), both as graduate student (Ph.D. 1889) and professor. The third period (1912-1952) was that of the retired professor writing and traveling in Europe, and eventually adopting Rome as his center of activity.

Santayana’s birth name was Jorge Agustín Nicolás Ruiz de Santayana. At the time of his birth Santayana’s father, Agustín Ruiz de Santayana, had only in the last few years met and married Josefina Borrás Sturgis, the recent widow of a Boston merchant named George Sturgis. While Agustín and Josefina united long enough to marry and produce young Jorge (the only child of their union), the two would ultimately part ways. Receiving financial support from her brother-in-law Robert (George Sturgis died leaving her little), Josefina decided to move herself and her surviving Sturgis children to Boston while for eight years young George and his father remained in Ávila. In 1872, father and son made the twelve-day sea voyage to Boston where Agustín briefly attempted to settle in with his wife and her Sturgis children, and, failing to do so, left young George with them to return to Spain in the spring of 1873. This early uprooting and estrangement from his father surely had a deep emotional impact on Santayana, and indeed in his autobiography he characterizes the move as a “moral disinheritance.”

Santayana had a rich early education, spending eight years at the Boston Latin School. He revealingly reflects on those early years (the fall of 1874 through 1882), in his autobiography: “…I know I was solitary and unhappy, out of humor with everything that surrounded me, and attached only to a persistent dream-life, fed on books of fiction, on architecture and on religion.” Besides Latin, students of the Boston Latin School studied Greek, Mathematics, History, French, English Composition, Literature, and Rhetoric. Through this exposure Santayana managed to develop a life-long appreciation for classical and medieval worlds and their cultural contributions, to a great extent preferring them to modern offerings. These appreciations would contribute a breadth of historical perspective to Santayana’s mature philosophical works that is unrivaled by his American contemporaries.

In his early education Santayana nurtured a love of poetry and even entertained seriously the possibility of becoming an architect. Entering Harvard upon graduation from the Latin School in 1882, Santayana respectively took his undergraduate and graduate degrees (B.A., ’86, Ph.D. ‘89), benefiting incalculably from the philosophical mentorship of his teachers, amongst whom were two of the most famous “golden age” Harvard philosophers: William James and Josiah Royce. Upon successful completion of his doctorate, Santayana, by now fully committed to the discipline, began teaching philosophy at Harvard in the fall of 1889. He would remain there until his departure at the zenith of academic success. In 1912 Santayana took advantage of a modest inheritance from the death of his mother to retire from Harvard, and left for Europe indefinitely.

As to his time in America, though he does offer the occasional fond or sympathetic reflection, Santayana largely hated academic life and commercialism and the dead Puritanism that he identified in his novel The Last Puritan. Probably referring obliquely to his own eventual feelings of exile in America, Santayana wrote: “It is natural for a man to like to live at home, and to live long elsewhere without a sense of exile is not good for his moral integrity” (Winds of Doctrine, Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1913, pg. 6).

He left the U.S. to live an intellectually free life in Oxford, Paris, and, after 1925, Rome. Unsuccessful in his efforts to leave Rome before World War II, on October 14, 1941 he entered the Clinica della Piccola Compagna di Maria, or “Convent of the Blue Nuns,” a hospital-clinic where he lived until his death in September of 1952. He is buried in the only Spanish plot in Rome’s Campo Verano Cemetery.

2. Writings

Next to Ralph Waldo Emerson, Santayana is arguably one of the best writers in the Classical American tradition. Most philosophers tend to read Santayana as a literary figure (which he is) rather than a serious philosopher (which he is also), part of which has to do with the fact that his publications strike in both directions simultaneously: an oddity from the perspective of a public that tends to quarantine the two areas of interest.

His philosophical works reflect two distinct periods, the early “humanistic” period in which he composed The Sense of Beauty (1896), Interpretations of Poetry and Religion (1900), and the five-volume The Life of Reason (1905-6); and the later “ontological” period which yielded Scepticism and Animal Faith (1923), and the four-volume ontology titled Realms of Being (between 1927 and 1940).

Santayana sometimes repudiated his earlier work, in part for its having the taint of academic life. He especially spoke down at times about the Life of Reason series for its association with the progressivism of the day, and it was later edited by Santayana and his late-life personal assistant and secretary, Daniel Cory, with the intent of removing some of its more humanistic overtones.

These authorial disparagements notwithstanding, The Life of Reason series holds up as one of the greatest philosophical works of the early half of the twentieth century. His peer and adversarial contemporary John Dewey praised the series in a review of 1907 as “the most adequate contribution America has yet made—always excepting Emerson—to moral philosophy” (John Dewey, in John Dewey: The Middle Works, Volume 4 [1907-1909], edited by Jo Ann Boydston, Southern Illinois University Press, 1977: 241). The series would have a lasting influence on naturalistic philosophy in the twentieth century.

In his budding writing career Santayana also published a volume of poetry (an 1894 collection titled Sonnets and Other Verses). Nevertheless his poetic muse would fade with the passing of years. Despite in his early years attracting a near-cult following of Harvard poets, and later maintaining the same mentorship through their Rome pilgrimages, letters, and solicitations of feedback, Santayana’s literary exertions would be restricted to fiction and philosophy.

Early in his career at Harvard, Santayana would feel the pressure to produce a work of philosophy. The Sense of Beauty (1896)—an exercise in aesthetic formalism—was culled from a series of lectures he gave between 1892 and 1893 as a newly appointed Harvard professor. The book contains the famous definition of beauty as “pleasure regarded as a quality of the thing.” To this day The Sense of Beauty is arguably the most widely read of Santayana’s philosophical corpus. This is most likely due to its restrictive scope in comparison to his other philosophical works, while there has been the tendency for Santayana’s more ambitious philosophy to be neglected. This neglect probably will subside with the ongoing MIT Press Critical Edition publications of The Works of Santayana, edited by William G. Holzberger and Herman J. Saatkamp, Jr.

After The Sense of Beauty, Santayana published Interpretations of Poetry and Religion in 1900, a work which famously provoked William James—Santayana’s then-recent colleague—to characterize his philosophy as a “perfection of rottenness.” The book also provoked a key recognition from the other of Santayana’s early influential mentors, and also dissertation advisor, Josiah Royce. Santayana relates that Royce told him around the time of Interpretations that “the gist of [his] philosophy [is] the separation of essence from existence” (“Apologia Pro Mente Sua” in The Library of Living Philosophers: The Philosophy of George Santayana, edited by Paul Arthur Schilpp, New York: Tudor Publishing, pg. 497). The ontological categories of “essence” and “matter” would become key components of Santayana’s mature philosophy. (See section 3c.)

Besides being a poet, philosopher, and novelist, Santayana was a hugely influential cultural critic. In a trenchant 1911 address before the Philosophical Union in California he coined the term “genteel tradition” and memorably provided the characterization of America as an “old wine in new bottles.” He wrote many similarly speculatively rich essays diagnosing the cultural character of the America of his time, some of which included penetrating philosophical criticisms of his contemporaries and former teachers, James and Royce. These diagnoses were early collected in the volume Character and Opinion in the United States (1920).

None of Santayana’s writings stray entirely from philosophical considerations, including his only fictional novel. Santayana authored a single best-selling work of fiction titled The Last Puritan, published in 1936. He spent several of his post-Harvard years composing the book, and many of the main characters reflect personalities close to the author. The main theme of the novel (co-titled: “Memoir in the Form of a Novel”) is of interest for its enhancing one’s understanding of Santayana’s view towards America. It chronicles the tragic, sacrificial life of Oliver Alden, the title-subject, a romantic and pious youth whose inner religious sensibilities conflict with the pulsating natural life around him. Alden is from one standpoint a sympathetic character, one with whom the author himself admitted affinities. But from another standpoint the protagonist represented the tragic contemporary American as Santayana understood him—partly in reaction to troubled young poets and artists Santayana knew from his Harvard days.

Santayana’s broader cultural criticism can be found in such works as Winds of Doctrine (1913) and the beautiful and unforced Soliloquies in England (1922), remarkably written amidst the uncertain, violent times of World War I. The latter is an exemplary instance—of which two others include Dialogues in Limbo (1926) and Platonism and the Spiritual Life (1927)—where one finds the post-Harvard Santayana following inspirations as they come, allowing both his literary imagination and penetrating philosophical eye to take equal share in the interpretive task.

These shorter works undoubtedly provided opportunities of creative release for Santayana as the ambitious project of conceiving a system of philosophy began to assert itself. In 1923 Scepticism and Animal Faith (hereafter SAF), the introductory text to his four-volume system of philosophy was published. SAF is one of the few Santayana works to have remained in print up to the present. The book introduces the terminology and critical background of his mature ontology, itself unfolded in four volumes over the period of thirteen years.

3. Philosophy

a. Ontology and Epiphenomenalism

Despite minor shifts in emphasis and Santayana’s own attitude towards his work, there is no radical break between the early humanistic Santayana, and the mature, ontological one. The same persistent distinction between ideals and natural grounds for those ideals—which he calls in his mature ontology “essence” and “matter”—holds throughout all of Santayana’s works; and the same abiding concern for reconciling moral with natural life remains intact.

As Royce had prophesied, an ontological distinction persisted throughout Santayana’s works: between “essence,” or the infinite realm of character embodiments that any existing thing must take on in order to be experienced by humans, and “existence,” or the groundless causal flux of nature that underlies any form whatsoever.

In the Life of Reason Santayana emphasizes the distinction between “perfections” or “ideals” and their “natural roots” which he sometimes calls a “natural ground” or “basis” for all action, thought and experience: “Every genuine ideal has a natural basis…Ideals are legitimate, and each initially envisages a genuine and innocent good; but they are not realizable together, nor even singly when they have no deep roots in the world.” Such ideals then are not Platonic forms, in that they have “roots” and bear the marks of their natural origins. Plato’s forms, on the contrary, are conceived as entirely foreign to natural origins.

But Santayana’s terminological shift from talking of ideals and natural grounds to talking of essence and matter perhaps did come at a certain cost. Throughout the evolution of his thinking Santayana holds to an increasing, and to many interpreters troubling, epiphenomenal view of consciousness. Briefly, epiphenomenalism is the view that mind is derivative, wholly caused, and has itself no causal power. Such strong epiphenomenalism comes out in the following passage from RB: “…the realm of matter cannot admit mind into its progressive structure and movement; each trope or rhythm must be complete before sensation can arise; so that this sensation is intrinsically a result and not a cause, a comment and not an agent…” If mind and sensation appear on the scene only as after-effects, one has to wonder how human experience can be considered fulfilling—how more specifically it can be anything but an ineffectual, spectator process.

There is however more than this to Santayana’s view of mind and accompanying story of human experience. To see this one needs a further understanding of the definitive concepts of his mature philosophy.

b. Realms and Terminology

The four realms of being Santayana identifies, in the order in which he published each RB volume, are essence, matter, truth, and spirit. The realms are said by Santayana to be “qualities of reality” (RB 183) (not themselves to be confused as parts of the cosmos), that are worth distinguishing to render human experience more fulfilling, intelligent, and edifying.

Santayana holds that the realms are irreducibly different and are for that reason worth distinguishing. The possibility that there are more realms is not something he dismisses; his only condition for an additional realm is that it be irreducibly distinct from the four he distinguishes.

As indicated, before introducing the realms individually Santayana set up their presentation through a penetrating and synthetic critical introduction, published in 1923 as Scepticism and Animal Faith. Understanding the project of SAF requires acquaintance with the meaning of key original concepts, amongst which are: “intuition,” “intent,” “psyche,” “animal faith,” and “skepticism.”

All belief, Santayana writes, is “a form of some faith in animal, material existence.” What Santayana calls “animal faith,” is the instinctive (if you will) and unavoidable tendency for human actions to betray a deep belief in the existence of matter. On Santayana’s account, one cannot act without believing in matter. According to Santayana, the denial in speech or dialectical skepticism of the existence of matter is a solipsistic, momentary pose. So philosophers like Descartes and Berkeley are transcendental posers, inflexibly denying in theory what they unhesitatingly affirm in practice. Worse yet, however: these Modern’s conflate functional orientations of the mind which Santayana respectively distinguishes as “intuition” and “intent.”

“Intuition” is for Santayana the contemplation or consciousness of an essence (more on these shortly) apart from belief in any particular existence. Santayana contrasts “intent” from intuition in order to capture the process of “taking” essences as existences. When we interact with, manipulate, engage, or otherwise encounter what we experience as physical objects, we are imbuing essences with intent—giving them a material existence they can never literally have. This process of intent is governed by the preferential makeup of what Santayana terms “psyche.”

The psyche is the material set of preferences that define individuality in organisms. The psyche is, very simply, the material manifestation of mind and as such it is imbued with, defined by, and stricken with belief. When one is believing, one is acting on behalf of one’s psyche. When one is intuiting essences without the addition of belief in their existence—be it a revery, daydream, or performative trance as in a locked moment of harmonious activity—one is communing spiritually with the realm of essence.

This raises the issue of skepticism: if we only ever have a symbolic grasp of material reality, and we can at any point imaginatively “escape” such symbolic play, what’s to keep us from relapsing into Cartesian (re)pose? The first ten chapters of SAF are an exercise in engaging Cartesianism, with the goal of pushing skepticism to its “ultimate” limits.

As a skeptic Descartes was half-hearted according to Santayana (as regards naturalism he also accused his contemporary John Dewey of this), in that he thought skepticism ceased with awareness of the self. For Santayana, nothing overcomes skepticism except pure intuition, the irony of which is the fact that pure intuition issues in the “discovery of essence,” which is itself a bankruptcy of knowledge (see “essence” below). So where Descartes had sought the most indubitable knowledge, and proceeded on the principle that such a thing could be achieved, Santayana tries to show in SAF that the principle of indubitable knowledge is itself a paradox; when knowledge is tested by way of a radical skepticism, and certainty is the ultimate goal, the paradox is that certainty is achieved only at the cost of knowledge itself. “Certainty,” for Santayana, is thus a transcendent vision of essence and as such has nothing to do with knowledge, much less with science.

So the goal of SAF is to bankrupt Cartesianism, and in doing so to suggest a new starting point for philosophy. That starting point is animal faith, the tacit acceptance of material reality as the source of understanding, knowledge, and common sense. Hence the title: “Skepticism AND Animal Faith”: we need skepticism to intellectually clear the way for, and at the same time to lead us back to, natural intelligence—to the realms themselves!

c. Realms Defined

Essence: The realm of essence should be understood to have a certain primacy since it is infinite and pertains to all of the forms or definite character embodiments that material objects and events may take on. Essence is what Santayana defines as the most radical sense in which anything is or has a character. Nothing—be it material objects, objects of thought, imaginings, flights of fancy, or objects of logical deduction—is experienced except through the mediation, or more accurately, “im-mediation” of essences. In his inimitable way, Santayana says of essences that they are “the only things people ever see and the last they notice.” Essences are said by Santayana to designate the realm of internal or intrinsic relations, and awareness of essences indicates a departure from what is called “knowledge,” which he defines as “faith mediated by symbols.” Awareness of essence is just that: awareness; it is direct and unmediated and as such entails no faith (belief in realities not given).

Matter: The catch however is that Santayana is a thoroughgoing materialist, in that he holds that no form can appear to human intuition without the previous establishment of material conditions for that form to arise. Matter is the primordial existential flux and is an unintelligible “surd.” This does not mean, however, that matter cannot be “known,” at least provisionally. Like Spinoza’s substance, existence or matter for Santayana has no purpose, but imposes external, natural limits to all activity. Those external limits define human life and mark off the boundaries between human understanding and the unfathomable depths of material existence. Santayana holds that humans know matter only at a remove, that is, (to repeat) symbolically. Matter is in fact referred to by Santayana as a “metaphor” only, producing one of the more provocative aspects of his philosophy: science is no less literary than poetry in representing matter in that it must express its truths at a remove, through the lens of human bias. In this sense Santayana’s materialism is, to use a contemporary term, “non-reductive.” Whatever scientists keep telling us of matter, while it is the hallmark of wisdom to defer everyday understanding to these experts (their findings do after all indicate a provisional advance upon previous understanding and serve contemporary sympathies very well), it is for Santayana only spiritual nearsightedness to deem such knowledge exhaustive of the cosmos.

Truth: As a fourth realm of being, truth wasn’t conceived by Santayana until after the first three (essence, matter and spirit) had been distinguished, and may therefore be justly supposed to have been introduced somewhat ad hoc. Whatever the reason, by 1913 (10 years before the publication of SAF) Santayana had conceived truth to round out his fourfold ontology. Truth is alleged by Santayana to be a subset of the infinite realm of essence. The realm of truth is the total inventory of essences instantiated by matter. The master metaphor for truth is given by Santayana in RB as: “Truth is the furrow which matter must plow upon the face of essence.” All events that take place entail concatenations of essences elected by matter for appearance in the course of human life, and their objective relations—factual arrangement, for example, that the terrorist attacks in America in 2001 took place on September 11th rather than the 12th—introduce the possibility of truth for human understanding.

Though there are similarities, Santayana’s view of truth differs in important respects from that of Classical pragmatists: truth for Santayana is fully objective and not necessarily presupposing of a cognizing agent; it is the necessary condition for the possibility of true opinions (Santayana appeals to the self-conscious act of lying as evidence of this fact); judgments are true if and only if they faithfully reproduce a portion of the descriptive properties of the process of the world coming, becoming, and going away into existence. These features of truth are guaranteed by the eternal status of the terms of its acknowledgement: essences.

Thus the pragmatist account of truth as what “works,” in the sense of what fits the current standard comprehensive description of the world is acceptable to Santayana so long as there is an understanding that the terms that make truth possible, namely, essences, are eternal, everlasting possibilities of experience that are not reducible to that experience. This is where Santayana especially departs from the pragmatist account of truth: it is not reducible to experience.

Spirit: Finally, Santayana distinguishes the realm of spirit, which is neither more nor less mysterious than one’s everyday understanding of consciousness. Santayana defines consciousness as the “total inner difference between being asleep and awake.” John Lachs has characterized Santayana’s spirit as that part of a life constituted by its series of intuitions. The native affinity of mind is, according to Santayana, to essence and not to fact. (This is an important outcome of his engagement with and overcoming of Cartesianism.) As such consciousness may play with appearances apart from the believing intent of the organic manifestation of mind (psyche); to the extent that it does so play, the spiritual life has been lived. Spirit is the ability of mind to turn natural events and experiences into appearances of themselves, and in so doing allow a healthy cosmic repose even as nature moves ceaselessly, beautifully, and sometimes destructively along.

In this way the core contribution of Santayana’s philosophy can be seen to culminate in a reconciliation of spirit and nature, two realities very much at odds in contemporary life. Santayana’s status as something of an “acquired taste” philosopher may plausibly be argued to be a function of his uncommon ability to uphold two sincere sympathies: on the one hand with Platonism and the spiritual life, and on the other with the life of reason which includes an openness to the advantages of three phases of moral life he called in that same-titled volume “pre-rational morality,” “rational ethics,” and “post-rational morality.”

4. Naturalism in World Perspective

As should not be surprising from what has been presented, Santayana consistently praises select philosophers and philosophies from history for what he considers their “naturalistic piety.” From the Ancient world, Santayana was deeply impressed with Lucretius, and also what he gleaned from Eastern Indian philosophy. Of the Modern philosophers, Santayana reserves his highest praise for Spinoza.

Backed by these historical allies, Santayana provides in a soliloquy a memorable (if partly irreverent) arrangement of world-philosophies:

…the progress of philosophy has not been of such a sort that the latest philosophers are the best: it is quite the other way…the later we come down in the history of philosophy the less important philosophy becomes, and the less true in fundamental matters.
Suppose I arrange the works of the essential philosophers—leaving out secondary and transitional systems—in a bookcase of four shelves; on the top shelf (out of reach since I can’t read the language) I will place the Indians; on the next the Greek naturalists; and to remedy the unfortunate paucity of their remains, I will add here those free inquirers of the renaissance, leading to Spinoza, who after two thousand years picked up the thread of scientific speculation; and besides, all modern science: so that this shelf will run over into a whole library of what is not ordinarily called philosophy. On the third shelf I will put Platonism, including Aristotle, the Fathers, the Scholastics, and all honestly Christian theology; and on the last, modern or subjective philosophy in its entirety. I will leave lying on the table, as of doubtful destination, the works of my contemporaries. There is much life in some of them. I like their water-colour sketches of self-consciousness, their rebellious egotisms, their fervid reforms of phraseology, their peep-holes through which some very small part of things may be seen very clearly: they have lively wits, but they seem to me like children playing blind-man’s-buff; they are keenly excited at not knowing where they are. (“The Progress of Philosophy,” in Soliloquies in England and Later Soliloquies, Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1922: 208-210)

Santayana recommends placing on the bottom, "inferior" shelves all the philosophy that is published, reprinted, and discussed in universities across the Western world today. This recommendation motivated one critic to characterize Santayana as a "defiant eclectic" (Charles Hartshorne, "Santayana's Defiant Eclecticism" in The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. LXI. No. 1, 1964: 35-44), suggesting that his thinking amounts to a high-minded circumvention of the real problems of philosophy through the sublimation of a few eccentric doctrines. This point is still an issue among Santayana scholars. What is clear is that Santayana combined an indisputably rich reading of the history of philosophy with an unparalleled synoptic critical vision.

5. Legacy

Santayana’s philosophy has had a modest, unsettled legacy, one which nevertheless surprises in its continuing ability to attract sensibilities from across academic disciplines. While his thinking never has, and likely never will be, given to indoctrination or discipleship, it is clear that Santayana never conceived of these as important and justifiably suspected that such things were bad rather than good indications that a philosophy is worthy of the world it struggles to understand.

Still, a glowing campfire of devotion to Santayana’s work persists, first through the institutional support of the MIT Press and the staff of the Santayana Edition at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis (IUPUI); and second from the scholarly contributions made to the only Santayana journal, Overheard in Seville: Bulletin of the Santayana Society. The Bulletin is published annually and is edited by Angus Kerr-Lawson. The Santayana Society meets annually in December at the Eastern gathering of the American Philosophical Association and has recently been added to the proceedings of the annual meetings of the Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy. MIT Press is in the process of publishing a critical edition of The Works of George Santayana, several of which are currently released.

The future of Santayana studies, whatever their course, will depend upon genuine interest in a non-reductive philosophical naturalism that expresses deep respect to religious sensibilities and leads the charge for the return to a conception of philosophy as a way of life rather than as a critical profession with little relevance to inner experience.

6. References and Further Reading

a. MIT Press Critical Editions

All works by George Santayana are undergoing republication as critical editions through MIT Press, under the editorship of William G. Holzberger and Herman J. Saatkamp, Jr., and the editorial work of those affiliated with the Santayana Edition at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis.

  • Persons and Places (1987).
  • The Sense of Beauty (1988).
  • Interpretations of Poetry and Religion (1990).
  • The Last Puritan (1994).
  • The Letters of George Santayana: Books I-VIII (2001-2008).

b. Other Santayana Works

  • Animal Faith and Spiritual Life. Edited by John Lachs. New York: Appleton-Century- Crofts, 1967.
  • The Birth of Reason and Other Essays. Daniel Cory, editor. New York and London: Columbia University Press, 1968.
  • Character and Opinion in the United States. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1921.
  • Dialogues in Limbo. The University of Michigan Press, 1948.
  • Dominations and Powers: Reflections on Liberty, Society, and Government. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1951.
  • Egotism in German Philosophy. Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1940.
  • Essays in Literary Criticism. Edited by Irving Singer. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1956.
  • The Genteel Tradition: Nine Essays by George Santayana. Lincoln and London: The University of Nebraska Press, 1967.
  • The Idea of Christ in the Gospels. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1946.
  • Life of Reason or The Phases of Human Progress, One Volume Edition. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1955.
  • Obiter Scripta. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1936.
  • The Philosophy of Santayana. Edited by Irwin Edman. The Modern Library, 1936.
  • Poems. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1923.
  • The Realms of Being. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1942.
  • Santayana on America: Essays, Notes, and Letters on American Life, Literature, and Philosophy. Edited by Richard Colton Lyon. New York: Harcourt, Brace & World, Inc., 1968.
  • Scepticism and Animal Faith. New York: Dover Publications, 1923, 1955.
  • Soliloquies in England and Later Soliloquies. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1922.
  • Some Turns of Thought in Modern Philosophy. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1933.
  • Winds of Doctrine: Studies in Contemporary Opinion. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1913.

c. Books About Santayana

  • Ames, Van Meter. Proust and Santayana: The Aesthetic Way of Life. New York: Willett, Clark & Company, 1937.
  • Arnett, Willard E. Santayana and the Sense of Beauty. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1957.
  • Butler, Richard. The Life and World of George Santayana. Chicago: A Gateway Edition, 1960.
  • Coleman, Martin; Santayana Edition (IUPUI).  The Essential Santayana: Selected Writings.  Compiled with an introduction by Martin Coleman and the Santayana Edition at IUPUI.  Indiana University Press, 2009.
  • Cory, Daniel. The Letters of George Santayana. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1955.
  • Cory, Daniel. Santayana: The Later Years; A Portrait With Letters. New York: George Braziller, 1963.
  • Flamm, Matthew Caleb and Krzysztof Piotr Skowronski. Under Any Sky: Contemporary Readings of George Santayana. Newcastle: Cambridge Scholars Publishing, 2007.
  • Howgate, George W. George Santayana. New York: A.S. Barnes and Co., Inc., 1961.
  • Lachs, John. On Santayana. Wadsworth, 2000.
  • Lachs, John with Michael Hodges. Thinking in the Ruins: Wittgenstein and Santayana on Contingency. Vanderbilt University Press, 2000.
  • Levinson, Henry Samuel. Santayana, Pragmatism, and the Spiritual Life. Chapel Hill and London: The University of North Carolina Press: 1992.
  • Lamont, Corliss, editor. Dialogue on George Santayana. New York: Horizon Press, 1959.
  • Munson, Thomas N. The Essential Wisdom of George Santayana. New York: Columbia University Press, 1962.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur, editor. The Library of Living Philosophers: The Philosophy of George Santayana. New York: Tudor Publishing Company, 1951.
  • Singer, Irving. George Santayana, Literary Philosopher. Yale University Press, 2000.
  • Sprigge, Timothy. Santayana. London and New York: Routledge, 1995.
  • Woodward, Anthony. Living in the Eternal: A Study of George Santayana. Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1988.

Author Information

Matthew Caleb Flamm
Email: mflamm@rockford.edu
Rockford College
U. S. A.

Charles Sanders Peirce: Architectonic Philosophy

peirceThe subject matter of architectonic is the structure of all human knowledge. The purpose of providing an architectonic scheme is to classify different types of knowledge and explain the relationships that exist between these classifications. The architectonic system of C. S. Peirce (1839-1914) divides knowledge according to it status as a "science" and then explains the interrelation of these different scientific disciplines. His belief was that philosophy must be placed within this systematic account of knowledge as science. Peirce adopts his architectonic ambitions of structuring all knowledge, and organizing philosophy within it, from his great philosophical hero, Kant. This systematizing approach became crucial for Peirce in his later work. However, his belief in a structured philosophy related systematically to all other scientific disciplines was important to him throughout his philosophical life.

Table of Contents

  1. The Architectonic System
  2. Mathematics and Philosophy
  3. Philosophy
    1. Phenomenology
    2. The Normative Sciences
      1. Aesthetics and Ethics
      2. Logic
    3. Metaphysics
  4. The Importance of the Systematic Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Architectonic System

In later work, Peirce began to organize and systematize his philosophy in terms of its relation to other areas of knowledge. More crucially for his philosophy, though, this enabled him to make explicit the structure and interrelation of different areas of his philosophical thought. In work like his 1902 Carnegie Institute Application, letters to friends, and more conventional writings, Peirce placed his philosophy within a hierarchical classification of sciences. Within this systematization of sciences, "science" is a broad term meaning any organization of human knowledge. The result is that disciplines like history, biographical study and art criticism count as "science." The sheer number of sciences involved in Peirce's classification, then, meant that he needed to sub-divide them further. The basis of Peirce's sub-divisions is not altogether clear or straightforward, but he seems to count Philosophy as a "formal science of discovery." What Peirce means by this is that Philosophy is concerned with discovering the formal or necessary conditions for the objects with which it concerns itself. Whether this is an accurate classification of philosophy is hard to say, but the idea is that philosophy shares some formal (i.e. quest for necessary conditions) concerns with mathematics and shares a concern for discovering knowledge with the empirical or physical sciences, like chemistry or physics; hence philosophy is a "formal science of discovery." The hierarchical classification of sciences in relation to philosophy and the hierarchical structure of philosophy itself, then, looks, roughly, as follows:

1) MATHEMATICS

2) PHILOSOPHY

which consists of:

a) Phenomenology

b) Normative Science

which consists of:

i) AESTHETICS

ii) ETHICS

iii) LOGIC

which consists of:

a) Philosophical Grammar

b) Critical Logic

c) Methodeutic

c) Metaphysics

3) PHYSICAL SCIENCE
Figure 1

In creating a systematized classification of science, Peirce hoped to make the connection between different areas of his thought clear, not only to others, but also to himself. If Peirce was able to see how his pragmatism, say, was related to other areas of his philosophy, and how his philosophy in general related to other sciences, he might be able to gain insights into the theory of pragmatism as a consequence. Peirce was, however, aware that a systematic classification of sciences is, to some extent, an abstraction that simplifies the relations between sciences. For the most part, though, he found that it accurately represented his thoughts on philosophy and was a useful tool for organizing his theories.

As suggested already, the sciences and philosophy are organized in a hierarchical fashion. So, from Figure 1., we can see that Mathematics is super-ordinate to philosophy, and philosophy super-ordinate to the physical sciences. Similar relations of super and sub-ordinacy also exist within philosophy and within particular branches of philosophy. The first thing to clarify is that the sub-ordinacy of philosophy to mathematics, or metaphysics to phenomenology, is not sub-ordinacy in the sense of embeddedness, i.e., philosophy is not a sub-branch of mathematics. Of course, embedded sub-ordinacy does occur in Peirce's classification where, for instance, aesthetics is a sub-branch of Normative Science, just as ethics and logic are. However, ethics and logic are not sub-branches of aesthetics, even though they are sub-ordinate to it. So, what is the nature of the non-embedded sub-ordinacy of, say, philosophy to mathematics?

Non-embedded sub-ordinacy is more a notion of linear priority than topical subsumption. This is because Peirce is organizing sciences in a fashion popularized by Auguste Comte in the nineteenth century, whereby super-ordinate sciences provide general laws or principles for sub-ordinate sciences which provide concrete, realized cases of those general principles. Super-ordinacy, then, is meant to be linear priority in terms of prior provision of general principles, and sub-ordinacy, the posterior realization of those general principles. A contrived example of how this works may go something as follows:

Psychology provides general principles that suggest that the emotional states of human beings are manipulable through sound, i.e., human emotion is susceptible to auditory suggestion. Using that principle, musicians can discover that musical arrangements in minor keys, particularly D minor, invoke sadness amongst listeners. Wagner, for instance, discovered that all chords have a corresponding chord which "resolves" the sequence, leaving the listener satisfied. By consistently refusing to "resolve" chords in his music, Wagner was able to induce tension and anxiety amongst his listeners wherever he wished to do so. These cases of actual musical practice provide concrete, confirming phenomena of the general psychological principle. Psychology, then, is super-ordinate to music, in the sense that it provides general principles for musical practice.

Applied to the hierarchy in figure 1., mathematics provides general laws, which Peirce often calls guiding or leading principles, for philosophy. Philosophy, in turn, provides concrete or confirming cases of those laws. Similar relations exist within philosophy itself, and between philosophy and the empirical sciences. Peirce is not always forthcoming with explicit examples of guiding principles, but, as we shall examine in more detail below, in the case of philosophy and its super-ordinate science, mathematics, he gives us a good indication of what he has in mind.

2. Mathematics and Philosophy

Peirce divides mathematics into three areas that correspond roughly to discrete mathematics, mathematics of the infinite, and mathematical or formal logic. We now think of Peirce's groundbreaking work in mathematical logic as belonging to logic proper rather than being a branch of mathematics. More important though is the role of mathematics as the provider of guiding principles for subsequent sciences, and particularly philosophy. Following his father, Peirce treated mathematics as "the science which draws necessary conclusions." What Peirce means is that mathematics is free from existential concerns about its constructs. In this sense, it is hypothetical and abstract. Peirce, for instance, states that mathematics "makes constructions in the imagination according to abstract precepts, and then observes these imaginary objects, finding in them relations of parts not specified in the precept of construction." What Peirce means is that mathematics creates hypothetical constructions, i.e., constructions which are abstracted and not necessarily actual, and then derives logically necessary connections between them and about them. These "necessary conclusions" about mathematical constructs provide general laws or principles for deriving logically necessary connections between and about all constructs, imaginary or actual. In short, the kinds of reasoning employed in mathematics provide general rules of reasoning, and function as principles to guide our reasoning in subsequent science, particularly philosophy.

For example, we can see the provision of guiding or leading principles from mathematics through the following story about irrational numbers. An irrational number is a number which cannot be expressed as the ratio of two integers. That is, the irrational number is a non-terminating, non-repeating decimal. How did our number systems develop to include numbers other than rational integers? One thought is that Pythagoras realized that there necessarily exists no pair of rational integers such that one can be expressed as the twice the square of the other. The way he came to this conclusion is by noting that in a square whose sides measure one unit in length, the diagonal measures neither one unit nor two units. Consequently, there must exist some other kind of non-rational number which enables us to explain the length of a square's diagonal in relation to its sides. Now, the way in which Pythagoras came about this conclusion was to note certain features about some diagram (of a square), abstract important features from that particular case, and draw a more general conclusion. These methods of abstraction and generalization are precisely the kind of thing that Peirce has in mind when he says that mathematics, as a super-ordinate science, provides guiding principles for philosophy.

3. Philosophy

Philosophy is divided into three orders: phenomenology, or the science of how things appear to us; the normative sciences, which study how we ought to act; and metaphysics, the study of what is real. Philosophy takes from mathematics the principles of drawing necessary consequences from hypotheses. Further, the three branches of philosophy have hierarchical relationships. Phenomenology uses the principles of mathematics and theorizes on the necessary qualities that all phenomena must have. After this, the normative and metaphysical sciences use, reflect and provide concrete cases of these phenomenological findings.

Similar divisions occur within the branches of philosophy but the most interesting of these is the division within normative science between aesthetics, ethics and logic. Logic within normative science is conceived as semiotics, or the study of signs, and is strongly epistemological in its concern with the structure of knowledge and understanding. As the hierarchy suggests, logic is dependent upon ethics and ethics upon aesthetics. All of these are dependent upon the principles of phenomenology and, more broadly still, upon mathematics. Further, they are all super-ordinate to metaphysics. This is largely because metaphysics concerns itself with the reality and place within nature of these objects. Metaphysics, as the science of what is real, is most similar to the physical sciences and is in many ways meant to be a bridging discipline between philosophy and natural science. As should be clear, the hierarchy moves from abstract disciplines to those whose study involves phenomena that are more concrete.

We know how the three philosophical sub-disciplines are meant to relate to each other in terms of the hierarchy. However, we have yet to examine Peirce's theories of phenomenology, normative science, and metaphysics in any detail. In the following sections, though, we shall examine each of the three sub-disciplines, and in the case of normative science its sub-sub-disciplines, and look a little more closely at what Peirce take these topics to concern.

a. Phenomenology

The first and most abstract of philosophy's sub-disciplines is phenomenology. For Peirce, phenomenology is the science of appearances and is abstract in the sense that its subject matter is still general and hypothetical, just as the constructs of mathematics are. However, whereas the general hypothetical subject of mathematics and mathematical reasoning is any theoretical construct, for phenomenology the constructs are those of experience, considered in generalized terms.

In his discussion of phenomenology, Peirce divides all our experience into three general, universal categories and names them firstness, secondness, and thirdness. Peirce's categories are notoriously hard to understand. Indeed, Peirce thought it to be a science which we could only gain a hazy grasp of until we discovered the categories for ourselves in the course of our own experiences. The major problem with the categories, though, is that they are general and therefore difficult to explain in readily comprehensible terms. The best way to understand the categories, then, is to look at concrete examples that, in some way, exemplify firstness, secondness, or thirdness.

Peirce usually attempts to explain firstness, in general terms, as quality or feeling. It is perhaps more intuitive to grasp firstness this way: think of William James, Charles Peirce and Karl Marx; they all share the quality of being bearded. Let us abstract "beardedness" from this group of men and, when we consider that abstraction in and of itself, we are considering a firstness which those philosophers all share. Of course, the general concept of firstness is purer than this; "beardedness" is just an exemplification of it. Another example might come from Wittgenstein's discussion in the Philosophical Investigations of how we attend to shapes and colors of some objects. When I try to observe the shape of a vase, in separation from its color, size, etc., by squinting my eyes and tilting my head, I am attempting to observe a firstness of that object.

Resistance, existence or otherness, are all examples of secondness. Peirce often uses the scholastic concept of haecceity, or "thisness," to explain our experience of secondness. The idea is that when we experience some thing, we experience it as separate from other phenomena and as a brute thing of existence. It is this brute confrontational singularity that a thing experienced must have that Peirce thinks exemplifies secondness. It is our experience of an object as a thing separate to others within the universe that is an experience of secondness. A rather strange example might prove helpful in coming to understand what our experience of secondness might be like. Some historical commentaries of the first landings of the Spanish Conquistadors in South America report how the natives were in awe of these strange four-legged, two-armed, two headed God-like creatures. It seems that the Spanish rode ashore on horse back. Having never seen horses or white men before (let alone white men riding horses), the natives assumed that this was one creature. This seems like a rather strange case, but it perhaps provides a startling example of how we must re-organize our understanding when our experience fails to distinguish two instances of secondness. Of course, the minute the Conquistadors dismounted, the natives experienced the invader as separate to his horse, thereby experiencing his secondness.

Our experiences of mediation, intelligibility or understanding are examples of thirdness. When we place some experience within the structure of our understanding, when we assimilate an experience, we are experiencing thirdness. In many ways, thirdness is similar to the Hegelian notion of "synthesis" and captures the notions of development and growth. When we experience thirdness, we experience some sense of bringing phenomena into order with our knowledge. Principle exemplifiers of thirdness, then, are phenomena like laws, habits, conventions, reason, etc. Extending our previous example of the Conquistador, when the native saw him dismounted and experienced him as separate from his horse, he might also have come to understand that this stranger was, in fact, a man. This experience of understanding how this phenomenon fits into the world is, according to Peirce, meant to be an experience of thirdness.

The three categories are present in all experience but to differing degrees. Consequently, an experience of a quality like redness has firstness, secondness and thirdness; but it has firstness to a greater extent and so exemplifies that category. To see this, we should at least be clear that, as a quality, "redness" is a firstness just as "beardedness" is. However, our experience of the "redness" as existing means that it has secondness. Otherwise, we would be unable to experience it. And the fact that we are able to understand our experience of "redness" as just such an experience, means that it must also have an element of thirdness, otherwise we would be unable to assimilate that experience. So, our experience of "redness" has all three categories to some extent. However, the actual qualitative aspects of the experience, the very reason we call this an experience of "redness," are what predominate, and this is why we classify "redness" as a first, even though all of the categories are present to some extent.

Furthermore, despite the abstract nature of phenomenology, i.e., the hypothetical status of its constructs, it is not at odds with Peirce's scientific and experiential approach. As suggested earlier, Peirce maintains that phenomenology is something that we each must carry out and confirm for ourselves in our own experience. So, despite the initially abstract and theoretical appearance of phenomenology, it remains grounded in practice.

Finally, the universal categories are ever present in Peirce's work. In some respects, the categories are already present in the antecedent science of mathematics where Peirce describes them in terms of relations. The mathematical equivalent of firstness is one-place relational predicates like, "x is bearded"; of secondness is two-place relational predicates like, "x is the barber of y"; and of thirdness is three-place relational predicates like "x shaves y with z." The explanation of the categories in terms of relational predicates is an early attempt to explain firstness, secondness and thirdness on Peirce's part and as such should not be taken as reflecting upon the phenomenological account we are looking at here. It is, however, instructive to see one of Peirce's alternative attempts at explaining the universal categories. The phenomenological derivation of the categories that we are looking at here is a later development in Peirce's work, and reflects thought about categories that Peirce had always harbored, and is crucial to his systematic vision of philosophy.

b. The Normative Sciences

The normative sciences study the norms of worldly interaction. As Phenomenology studies the necessary qualities of experience, the normative sciences prescribe our response to those experiences. Further, there are three sub-areas within the normative sciences: aesthetics, ethics and logic. Aesthetics is the most abstract of the three normative sciences and provides foundational aims for the other prescriptive disciplines. Ethics explores these aims in relation to conduct, and logic explores those aims in relation to reasoning, a particular form of conduct.

i. Aesthetics and Ethics

Peirce's theories of aesthetics and ethics are not well developed. In many respects, Peirce self-consciously developed them for his system in order to provide foundations for logic. Consequently, his theories of aesthetics and ethics do not look too much like traditional theories. They are aesthetical and ethical in the sense of being theories of what is unconditionally admirable, and what is of value in human conduct, but they are not systematic or extensive. The two disciplines hold the usual hierarchical relations, with the super-ordinate science of aesthetics providing a general, guiding principle for its sub-ordinate science ethics, which in turn provides realized cases of that principle.

The only guiding principle from aesthetics to ethics that Peirce hints at is what he calls the "ultimate aesthetic ideal." The ultimate aesthetic ideal is, for Peirce, the growth of reason or rationality. He calls this the "growth of concrete reasonableness." For instance, the discovery that our galaxy is heliocentric and not geocentric marks a growth in concrete reasonableness, i.e., an increase in our grasp upon reality. Ethics, then, must take this general aesthetic ideal of the unconditionally admirable and ask, "What is admirable in the way of human conduct?" This makes ethics, for Peirce, a question of what kind of conduct is likely to see the growth of reason or rationality. The right action will take us towards achieving the aesthetic ideal, the wrong action will not.

Right conduct, then, is conduct that is self-controlled and deliberate. Further, it is self-controlled and deliberate in an attempt to achieve the aesthetic ideal. What is more, this self-controlled conduct is not simply about action for the individual in isolation; it is also about setting a precedent and providing an example for a community. For instance, I decide that I will never act without reflection upon rumors. I try, through self-controlled and deliberate response, to reflect upon the content and plausibility of the rumors I hear and to find out whether they are truthful or not. Only when I have done this do I act. Here is a case of adopting a particular kind of conduct with the aim of seeing the world become a more reasoned and rational place. However, when I die, my contribution to concrete reasonableness passes with me, unless I can spread this deliberate conduct further. This is precisely what Peirce thinks our ethical conduct should do; not by being purely about individual conduct, but by contributing habits, tendencies and general principles in conduct that others can see and adopt. Our contribution to achieving the aesthetic ideal, then, is not just the adoption of self-controlled conduct, but also establishing such conduct as a communal habit or convention. The growth of concrete reasonableness requires more than just action; it requires continued action.

Peirce has very little more to say about aesthetics and ethics. It appears the notions of the ultimate aesthetic ideal and what is unconditionally admirable in the way of human conduct are only interesting to Peirce as general guiding principles for the sub-ordinate discipline of logic.

ii. Logic

The third of the normative sciences, logic, takes the aim of aesthetics and the principles of ethics and applies them to reasoning. Logic, then, is self-controlled reasoning aimed at the growth of concrete reasonableness. It is as a form of conduct that logic takes a sub-ordinate position to ethics in the philosophical hierarchy.

Logic itself has three branches: Philosophical Grammar, Critical Logic and Methodeutic. Philosophical Grammar, often called Speculative Grammar, is a theoretical explanation and exploration of the nature of signs. This is the area within the hierarchy for Peirce's famous theory of Semiotics. It is located within logic conceived as the self-controlled conduct of reasoning because Peirce takes all thought, and so all reasoning, to occur through the use of signs. Philosophical Grammar, then, studies the nature of the basic phenomena of reasoning: signs. Signs are essentially triadic phenomena on Peirce's account, consisting of a sign vehicle, an object and an interpretant or interpreting thought which takes the sign to stand for its object. For instance, a fever is a sign of illness, which I understand as requiring treatment with medicine. The fever is the sign, the illness is its object, and my understanding of this connection is the interpretant. Peirce continually developed complex classifications for signs depending on the inter-relation between the sign, the object and the interpretant.

In many ways, we can see the sign as a concrete case of a general principle from phenomenology, which tells us that each experience will have firstness, secondness and thirdness. Indeed, Peirce sees the sign-vehicle as a firstness, the object as a secondness and the interpretant as a thirdness. However, after 1903, Peirce did not press this reflection of the phenomenological categories in his semiotic too far, even though he remained convinced that it existed.

The second branch of logic is Critical Logic, which studies types of argument. However, Peirce discusses more than just deductive arguments or reasoning within this branch of logic. He also includes discussion of inductive and abductive reasoning. Inductive reasoning, for Peirce, is quantitative reasoning and bears close resemblance to statistical analysis. On Peirce's analysis, induction is reasoning or argument to a general rule for a population based upon a sample from it. For instance, my sample of the metals in coins leads me to conclude that the pennies in current circulation have approximately 30% copper content. I have induced a general rule about the copper content of all pennies from a random sample of, say, 5% of the pennies in circulation. The more sampling I do the more accurate my general rule will become.

Abductive reasoning is similar to the inference to best explanation and provides conjectures for general rules by proffering some explanatory hypothesis based on some phenomena that we already know. A quick and simple way to grasp how Peirce thinks that abduction and induction are argument forms is to look at their structure in relation to the standard deductive syllogism. Consider the deductively valid argument: all felines are furry; all lions are felines; so all lions are furry. We can recast this to reflect the inductive form of argument like this: all lions are furry; all lions are felines; so all felines are furry. This is obviously a probabilistic argument based on sampling from a general population. We take what we know of some sample population - in this case, that lions as a sample of the general feline population are furry - and conclude that this is present in the population as a whole.

Again, we can recast the structure of the deductive argument to reflect abductive reasoning like this: all felines are furry; all lions are furry; so all lions are felines. Here we are taking two phenomena, the furriness of felines and the furriness of lions, and providing a conjecture that attempts to explain both phenomena with a single general rule.

Obviously, neither induction nor abduction are deductively valid, but Peirce still considers them to be important forms of reasoning and devotes discussion to them within the Critical Logic. Critical Logic also explains, through a discussion of how these arguments are useful, what counts as good or bad reasoning. Consequently, it further explains the purpose of the normative discipline of logic considered as a form of self-controlled conduct.

The third branch of logic is Methodeutic. Methodeutic is home to Peirce's theories of truth and inquiry and his pragmatic maxim. It concerns the use of signs and argument to create habits and forms of conduct conducive to achieving the logical take on the aesthetic ideal, a steady state of doubt resistant beliefs. For Peirce, the aim of logic or reasoning is to achieve a settled state of belief. The growth of this steady state comes from our desire to eradicate doubt, which causes considerable consternation according to Peirce. Whenever we encounter some phenomenon that casts doubt upon a belief of ours, we feel compelled to find the cause of the recalcitrant experience and settle our beliefs once more. This leads to a steady growth in our body of recalcitrant proof beliefs. Methodeutic, then, is the study of inquiry: or growth through reasoning in action.

c. Metaphysics

The final branch of philosophy is Metaphysics, the study of what is real. As phenomenology studies the necessary qualities of our experience, and the normative sciences prescribe our response to them, Metaphysics studies whether or not the objects of experience are real.

The first thing to note about Peirce's metaphysics is that it is still a distinctly "hands on" affair. Peirce's metaphysics, commonly labeled "scientific metaphysics," attempts to explain the reality of the phenomenological categories and of the methods and principles of inquiry as expounded in the normative sciences. This is all in contra-distinction to "Ontological Metaphysics," or metaphysics conducted by a priori reasoning. Peirce's pragmatism means that he is at odds with this kind of metaphysical endeavor. Since a concept's meaning relies upon its practical bearings, and the bulk of a priori metaphysics make no difference to practice or experience, the bulk of a priori metaphysics is meaningless. Again, this is similar to the verificationist's anti-metaphysical arguments, but where the logical positivists take this to mean the death of metaphysics, Peirce takes this to mean that a worthwhile metaphysics must be scientific, fallible, cautiously approached, and sub-ordinate to logic.

As with the normative sciences, Peirce makes various distinctions within the branch of metaphysics. Most interesting are his discussions of the reality of his phenomenological categories of firstness, secondness and thirdness and his evolutionary cosmology. In his discussion of the reality of the phenomenological categories, Peirce returns to the subject of his first philosophical discipline, phenomenology, where he identifies the three categories of firstness, secondness and thirdness as general features of all experience. Here, in his metaphysical work, Peirce turns his discussion to the reality of these phenomenological categories. His concern is to ask whether all or any of those categories are real independently of you or I. Does thirdness, for instance, really exist? If it does, then, on Peirce's view, "possibles" exist.

Peirce places himself with Aristotle, Kant and the Scottish Common-sense philosopher Thomas Reid in taking all three of the phenomenological categories to be real. However, since he takes his own "three category realism" to most strongly reflect the work of John Duns Scotus, Peirce labels himself a "scholastic realist." Peirce also characterizes other theories and philosophers depending on their own commitments to the reality of the phenomenological categories. For instance, in Peirce's opinion, "nominalism" does not take the category of thirdness to be real. Although the term "nominalism" is more normally part of mediaeval debate on the existence (or not) of universals, Peirce uses the term to refer to any theory that seems too hardheadedly committed to the explanation of phenomena in terms of concrete existent particulars. It is for this reason that Peirce labels as nominalist any theory which does not take the real existence of laws, generalities, possibilities, etc. seriously (i.e. is not committed to the existence of thirds or thirdness). Of course, it is possible, in Peirce's opinion, to move too far in the opposite direction. According to Peirce, Hegel's philosophy, for instance, places too much emphasis on thirdness at the expense of the other categories. Peirce's, own commitment to a three-category realism, though, is the source of the acute anti-nominalism which affects much of his other philosophical work.

Peirce's cosmological metaphysics is perhaps the most interesting of his metaphysical writings. Where his general metaphysics discusses the reality of the phenomenological categories, his cosmological work studies the reality and relation to the universe of his work in the normative sciences. The cosmological metaphysics looks at the aesthetic ideal (the growth of concrete reasonableness) and its attainment through growth and habit in the universe at large. In Peirce's cosmology, the universe grows from a state of nothingness to chaos, or all pervasive firstness. From the state of chaos, it develops to a state in which time and space exist, or a state of secondness, and from there to a state where it is governed by habit and law, i.e. a state of thirdness. The universe does this, not in a mechanistic or deterministic way, but by tending towards habit and a law-like nature through chance and spontaneous transition. This chance-like transition towards thirdness is the growth of concrete reasonableness, i.e. the attainment of the aesthetic ideal through the spontaneous development of habit.

Peirce's evolutionary cosmology has left many commentators uneasy about its relation to the rest of his work. His development of it during his own life time led some of his friends to fear for his sanity. Indeed, Peirce's turn towards cosmological metaphysics is often attributed to a mystical experience and crisis of faith in the 1890's. In truth, Peirce takes his cosmological work to be the logical upshot of the normative sciences and logic, which show the nature and desirability of the growth of reason. Cosmological metaphysics merely shows how the growth of concrete reasonableness occurs in the universe at large.

4. The Importance of the Systematic Interpretation

Traditionally, the systematic background to Peirce's theories of, say, pragmatism, inquiry, or the categories is ignored. This has lead to a failure to appreciate its significance to the detail of individual theories. Instead, the assessment of Peirce's philosophy is often made on an issue by issue basis. Take, for instance, Peirce's pragmatism. Its relation to the broader system enables Peirce to state his pragmatism and show how it need not lapse into nominalism, which is generally the outcome of pragmatic or verificationist principles. Understanding Peirce's devout anti-nominalism requires some grasp of his system and the place of the pragmatic maxim within it.

This, of course, is not to say that Peirce's philosophy must live and die by the systematic view. It is possible to take Peirce's views on individual topics and find much of value in them. However, interpreting Peirce's philosophy without any appreciation of the systematic background faces the danger of making serious mistakes about the import and intent of Peirce's work. Returning again to the Peirce's account of pragmatism, without the systematic background to provide some sense of Peirce's commitment to anti-nominalism and belief in the possibility of a scientific metaphysics, his pragmatism looks like a simple forerunner of the Logical Positivist's verification principle. Although common, such an interpretation fails to reflect the nuances of Peirce theory. Reaching a full understanding of Peirce's work on individual topics, then, is always best achieved with an eye on the systematic background.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first widespread presentation of Peirce's work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982-. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce's views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2). (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce's writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries, particularly by Nathan Houser in Volume 1.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, D. 1995. The Strands of System. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press).
    • A systematic reading of Peirce's thought which, in its introduction, makes an in-depth breakdown of the elements of the system and their relation to each other. Its main body reproduces two important papers by Peirce with accompanying commentary.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1985. Peirce. (London: Routledge and Kegan Paul).
    • Important treatment of Peirce as a systematic philosopher but with emphasis on Peirce's Kantian inheritance and later rejection of the transcendental approach to truth, logic and inquiry.

Author Information:

Albert Atkin
Email: pip99aka@sheffield.ac.uk
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom

American Philosophy

The term “American Philosophy,” perhaps surprisingly, has been somewhat vague. While it has tended to primarily include philosophical work done by Americans within the geographical confines of the United States, this has not been exclusively the case. For example, Alfred North Whitehead came to the United States relatively late in life. On the other hand, George Santayana spent much of his life outside of the United States. Until only recently, the term was used to refer to philosophers of European descent. Another focus for defining, or at least characterizing, American Philosophy has been on the types of philosophical concerns and problems addressed. While American philosophers have worked on traditional areas of philosophy, such as metaphysics, epistemology, and axiology, this is not unique to American Philosophy. Many scholars have highlighted American philosophers’ focus on the interconnections of theory and practice, on experience and community, though these, too, are not unique to American Philosophy. The people, movements, schools of thought and philosophical traditions that have constituted American Philosophy have been varied and often at odds with each other. Different concerns and themes have waxed or waned at different times. For instance, the analysis of language was important throughout much of the twentieth century, but of very little concern before then, while the relation between philosophy and religion, of great significance early in American Philosophy, paled in importance during much of the twentieth century. Despite having no core of defining features, American Philosophy can nevertheless be seen as both reflecting and shaping collective American identity over the history of the nation.

Table of Contents

  1. 17th Century
  2. 18th Century
  3. 19th Century
    1. Charles Peirce
    2. William James
    3. John Dewey
    4. Other Pragmatists
  4. 20th Century and Recent
  5. References and Further Reading

1. 17th Century

Though many people, communities and nations populated the area that is now the United States long before the U.S.A. became a nation-state, and they all wrestled with universal philosophical questions such as the nature of the self, the relationships between persons, their origins and destiny, most histories of American Philosophy begin with European colonization, especially from the time of the Puritans in New England. From the "Mayflower Compact," penned in 1620 as the early English settlers arrived in the New World, basic socio-political positions were made explicit and fundamental to newly established communities. Speaking of forming a covenant to "combine ourselves into a civil Body Politic," those arriving on the Mayflower immediately identified a close and ineliminable connection between individuals and their community. This sentiment was echoed in founding documents of other colonies, such as the Fundamental Orders of Connecticut (1639) and the Massachusetts Body of Liberties (1641). Likewise, the writings of prominent early colonial leaders, such as John Winthrop (1588-1649) emphasized "the care of the public must oversway all private respects…for it is a true rule that particular estates cannot subsist in the ruin of the public." Although highly influential, such views were not universal, as the Maryland Toleration Act (1649) and the writings of other influential leaders, e.g., Roger Williams (1603-1683) stressed religious tolerance over commitment to the religious covenant of a community. From the earliest concerns, then, even prior to the establishment of the United States, the social and political issues of the relation of individuals to their communities as well as the nature of the communities themselves (that is, as secular or religious) were paramount.

2. 18th Century

Broadly speaking, American Philosophy in the eighteenth century can be divided into two halves, the first still heavily influenced by the Calvinism of the Puritans and the second more directly along the lines of the European Enlightenment and associated with the political philosophy of the Founding Fathers (e.g., Thomas Jefferson, Benjamin Franklin).

Far and away the most significant thinker of the first half of the 18th century for American Philosophy was Jonathan Edwards (1703-1758). Often associated primarily with the fiery oratory of sermons such as "Sinners in the Hands of an Angry God," and the religious revivalist “Great Awakening” of the 1740s, Edwards both distilled and assimilated Calvinist theological thought and the emergent Newtonian scientific worldview. Frequently characterized as trying to synthesize a Christian Platonism, with an emphasis on the reality of a spiritual world, with an empiricist epistemology, an emphasis on Lockean sensation and Newtonian corpuscular physics, Edwards drew directly from the thought of Bishop George Berkeley, who stressed the necessity of mind (or non-material reality) to make sense of human experience. This non-material mind, for Edwards, consists of understanding and will, both of which are passive at root. It is understanding that, along lines of the successes of Newtonian physics, leads to the fundamental metaphysical category of Resistance, which Edwards characterizes as "the primary quality of objects." That is, whatever features objects might have, what is fundamental to something qua object is that is resists. This power of resistance is "the actual exertion of God's power" and is demonstrated by Newton's basic laws of motion, in which objects at rest or in motion will remain undeterred until and unless acted on by some other force (that is, resisted). Understanding, though, is different than will. Edwards is perhaps best known for his rejection of free will. As he remarked, "we can do as we please, but we cannot please as we please." Just as there is natural necessity and natural inability, for Edwards, there is moral necessity and moral inability. Every act of will is connected to understanding, and thus determined. Echoing the views of John Calvin, Edwards saw not (good) works, but the grace of God as the determiner of human fortune.

While couched primarily in a religious context for Edwards but less so for others, the acceptance and adaptation of a Newtonian worldview was something shared by most American philosophers in the latter half of the 18th century. These later thinkers, however, abandoned to a great extent the religious context and focused rather on social-political issues. Sharing many commitments of European philosophers of the Age of Enlightenment (such as a reliance on reason and science, a broad faith in scientific and social progress along with a belief in the perfectibility of humans, a strong advocacy of political democracy and laissez-faire economics), many of the famous names of American history identified themselves with this enlightenment thought. While they attended very little to basic issues of metaphysics or epistemology, the Founding Fathers, such as Thomas Jefferson (1743-1826), Benjamin Franklin (1706-1790), and James Madison (1751-1836), wrote voluminously on social and political philosophy. The American Declaration of Independence as well as the United States Constitution, with its initial amendments, better known as the Bill of Rights, was drafted at this time, with their emphasis on religious toleration. Though including explicit references to God, these thinkers tended to commit themselves in their writings less to Christianity per se and more to deism, the view of God as creator of a world governed by natural laws (which they believed were explicated for the most part by Newton) but not directly involved with human action. For example, as early as 1730 and as late as 1790 Franklin spoke of God as world-creator and Jesus as providing a system of morality but with no direct commitment to the divinity of Jesus or to any organized church. Instead, a major focus of concern was the appropriate nature of the State and its relation to individuals. While the thought of Thomas Jefferson, exemplified in the language of the Declaration of Independence, emphasized natural, inalienable rights of individuals against the tyranny of the State - with the legitimacy of the State only in securing the rights of individuals - federalists such as James Madison highlighted dangers of factional democracy, with his view of protecting both individual rights and the public good.

3. 19th Century

In a letter to John Adams written in 1814, Thomas Jefferson complained that, while the post-revolutionary American youth lived in happier times than their parents, this younger generation held "all knowledge which is not innate, [to be] in contempt, or neglect at least." Their “folly” included endorsing "self-learning and self-sufficiency; of rejecting the knowledge acquired in past ages, and starting on the new ground of intuition." These complaints reflected Jefferson's concerns about the rise of romanticism in early nineteenth century America. Transcendentalism, or American Romanticism, was the first of several major traditions to characterize philosophical thought in America's first full century as a nation, with Transcendentalism succeeded by the impact of Darwinian evolutionary thought and finally developing into America's most renowned school of thought, Pragmatism. A Hegelian movement, centered in St. Louis and identified largely with its chief proponent, George Holmes Howison (1834-1916), occurred in the second half of the nineteenth century, but was overshadowed by the rise of Pragmatism. Even the journal founded in 1867 by the St. Louis Hegelians, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, became best known later on because of its publication of essays by the pragmatist Charles Peirce (1839-1914).

Where the thinkers of the American enlightenment stressed social and political concerns, based on a Newtonian mechanistic view of the world, the thinkers of American Transcendentalism took the emphasis on individuals and their relation to the community in a different direction. This direction was based not on a mechanistic view of the world, but on an organic metaphor that stressed the subjective nature of human experience and existence. Highlighting personal experience and often even a fairly mystical holism, writers such as Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803-1882), Henry David Thoreau (1817-1872), and Walt Whitman (1819-1892) argued for the priority of personal non-cognitive, emotional connections to nature and to the world as a whole. Human are agents in the world more fundamentally than they are knowers of the world. "Real" knowledge is intuitive and personal; it transcends scientific understanding that is based on empirical sense experience. Because of this, those things that constrain or restrict free personal thought, such as conventional morality and political institutions, need to be transcended as well. This spirit is captured in the poetry of Walt Whitman's "Song of Myself" in which he claims, “I celebrate myself…Unscrew the locks from the doors! Unscrew the doors themselves from their jambs! I speak the past-word primeval, I give the sign of democracy…." This sentiment is echoed in the works of Emerson and Thoreau, both of whom argue for the importance of self-reliance, intuition, and a return to nature, i.e., an embracing of what is non-civilized and non-industrial. In his 1836 paper, "Nature," Emerson states, "In the woods, we return to reason and faith…I am nothing; I see all; the currents of the Universal Being circulate through me; I am part or parcel of God…In the wilderness I find something more dear and connate than in streets and villages." Emerson's "The Transcendentalist” (1842) stands as a manifesto of this philosophical movement, in which he explicitly identifies Transcendentalism as a form of philosophical Idealism. Emerson wrote:

As thinkers, mankind have ever been divided into two sects, Materialists and Idealists; the first class founding on experience, the second on consciousness; the first class beginning to think from the data of the senses, the second class perceive that the senses are not final, and say, The senses give us representations of things, but what are the things themselves, they cannot tell…Society is good when it does not violate me, but best when it is likest to solitude. Everything real is self-existent. Everything divine shares the self-existence of Deity…[Kant showed] there was a very important class of ideas or imperative forms, which did not come by way of experience, but through which experience was acquired; that these were intuitions of the mind itself; and he denominated them Transcendental forms.

At the same time, during the 1830s and 1840s, there were other thinkers who stressed greater social and political equality, particularly several important women writers and activists, such as Sarah Grimké (1792-1873) and Elizabeth Cady Stanton (1815-1902). The call for social and political emancipation, in many ways a call to fulfill the promise of the American enlightenment, came not just from women such as Grimké and Stanton, but also from those demanding the abolition of slavery, notably William Lloyd Garrison (1805-1879) and Frederick Douglass (1817-1895).

Just as much of American philosophical thought was influenced by the success of Newton's scientific worldview throughout the eighteenth century, the publication of Charles Darwin's evolutionary theory in 1859 had a great impact on subsequent American philosophy. Though not known widely outside of academic circles, two thinkers in particular wrote passionately for re-conceiving philosophical concerns and positions along Darwinian lines, John Fiske (1842-1901) and Chauncey Wright (1830-1875). Both stressed the need to understand consciousness and morality in terms of their evolutionary development. Such a naturalistic, evolutionary approach became even more pronounced at the end of the twentieth century. It was outside of academia, however, often under the label of "Social Darwinism" that this view had even greater impact and influence, especially via the writings of Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) and William Graham Sumner (1840-1910). Both Spencer and Sumner likened societies to organisms, in a struggle for survival. Indeed, it was Spencer, not Darwin, who coined the term "survival of the fittest" to capture what he (and many others) took to be the significance of evolutionary theory. If groups within a society, and even societies themselves, are - like biological organisms – in a constant competition for survival, then a sign of their fitness is the fact that the do in fact survive, for Spencer. Such competition, indeed, is useful and good, for in the long run those that survive will have competed and won, a clear statement of their superiority. Spencer, Sumner and others, such as the industrialist Andrew Carnegie (1835-1919), argued that the social implication of the fact of such struggle for survival is that free-market capitalism is the natural economic system and the one that will ensure the greatest success for a society's economic well-being. In Sumner’s essay, "The Man of Virtue," he remarks that, "Every man and woman in society has one big duty. That is, to take care of his or her own self…Society, therefore, does not need any care or supervision." Carnegie's "The Gospel of Wealth” echoes this view: "[The law of competition] is here, we cannot evade it; no substitutes for it have been found; and while the law may be sometimes hard for the individual, it is best for the race, because it insures the survival of the fittest in every department…the law of competition [is] not only beneficial, but essential to the future progress of the race." The emphasis on competition as the key to evolutionary thought was not shared by everyone, however. One prominent advocate of Darwin, who nevertheless argued that cooperation rather than competition was the message of evolutionary thought, was Lester Ward (1841-1913). Not only are those groups that cooperate and function together as a group more likely to survive than those that don't, he claimed, but human history has shown that government is a natural, emergent feature of human societies, rather than, contra Sumner, a hindrance and impediment to progress.

After Transcendentalism and evolutionary philosophy, the third and by far most renowned philosophical movement in nineteenth century America was Pragmatism. Informally christened as "pragmatism" in the 1870s by one of its most famous proponents, Charles Sanders Peirce, Pragmatism is seen by most philosophers today as the classic American philosophical tradition. Not easily definable, Pragmatism is a constellation of principles, stances, and philosophical commitments, some of which are more or less salient for particular pragmatism philosophers (as will be noted below). Nevertheless, there are threads that run across and through most pragmatists. There is a strong naturalistic bent, meaning that they look for an understanding of phenomena and concepts in terms of how they arose and how they play a part in our engagement with the world. Peirce's "pragmatic maxim" captures this stance as follows: "Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object." There is a rejection of a foundationalist view of knowledge. All knowledge claims are fallible and revisable. The flip side of such fallibility and revisibility is that no inquiry is disinterested. Beliefs are fundamentally instruments for us to cope with the contingencies of the world. In addition, there is an enunciated commitment to intersubjectivity and community. So, while rejecting the notion of any pure "givens," of experience, pragmatists also reject any pure subjectivism or abandonment of standards or criteria of adjudication beyond the individual. Unlike the American philosophical movements that preceded Pragmatism, pragmatists wrestled with issues and concerns across the philosophical spectrum, from basic metaphysics to epistemology to all forms of axiology (ethical, political, and even aesthetic).

a. Charles Peirce

Generally acknowledged as the "Big Three" classical pragmatists are Charles Peirce, William James (1842-1910), and John Dewey (1859-1952). Peirce, a polymath by all accounts, not only coined the term "pragmatism" in the 1870s, but did ground-breaking work in semiotics (the study of signs) as well as in logic, particularly in the logic of relations. In addition, while a scientist and mathematician by trade, he wrote a considerable amount on the philosophy of science (for example, on the nature of explanation), value theory, and metaphysics, including seminal work on categories. From his early writings in the 1860s, in which he criticized Cartesian doubt and foundationalist search for indubitability, to his later works on cognition and what he termed "evolutionary cosmology," Peirce continuously and consistently argued against forms of nominalism and in favor of realism, both in the sense that non-particulars are real (though perhaps not existent) and in the sense that our conceptions are of things independent of us. An important feature of Peirce's pragmatism is a strident rejection of subjectivism. This comes through in his insistence that, as inquirers do not exist in isolation, beliefs are not fulfilled (as he put it, the irritation of doubt is not overcome) in isolation. Rather, it is the development of successful habit that matters and it is the verdict of the community of inquirers in the long run that matters in the determination of what settles inquiry. Just as this is not a subjectivist view of what is real or true, it is also not a "social constructivist" view, in which what is real or true is determined by what society decides. Instead, as in the model of good science, there is a community of inquirers who form a system of checks and balances for any belief, but this community of inquirers operates within a world of objects, qualities, relations, and laws.

In establishing his notion of pragmatism as a means of clarifying and determining the meaning of signs, Peirce coined his "Pragmatic Maxim," noted above. This maxim not only points to pragmatism as a criterion of meaningfulness but also to pragmatism as a standard of truth. For Peirce, belief is not merely a cognitive state of an isolated agent, rather it encompasses an awareness of a state of affairs along with the appeasement of the irritation of doubt (or surprise) and - as genuine belief and not simply verbiage - the establishment of a habit, or rule of action. This requirement of a rule of action carries over for Peirce beyond epistemological concerns to metaphysical ones as well, particularly in his work on categories, or fundamental modes of being. Using varied terminology at different times, Peirce identified three fundamental categories of being. One category was that of Quality (or Firstness). This is the conception of being independent of anything else, such as the example of a pure tone or color. A second category was that of Brute Fact (or Secondness), that is being relative to or connected with something else. This might be a particular instance of a tone or a color sample. This is what he sometimes called the "demonstrative application" of a sign. Finally, there is Law, or Habit (or Thirdness), or mediation whereby a First and Second are brought into relation. This is the notion of regularity and representation, and as such involves a regulative as well as descriptive aspect. An example is a red light indicating the need to stop or perhaps indicating danger. Law, habit, regularity are neither reducible to the particular instances that are true of it (that is, Secondness) nor to the pure material quality of what is instantiated in those particulars (that is, Firstness). For Peirce, these three categories are all real, are all irreducible to the others, and are all involved in any form or act of inquiry. In particular, his insistence on the reality of Habit/Law was basic, as was noted above, to his advocacy of a pragmatist conception of inquiry.

b. William James

William James, known during his lifetime as much for his work in psychology as for his work in philosophy, did much more than Peirce to popularize the label and notion of pragmatism, both as a philosophical method for resolving disputes and as a theory of meaning and truth. Though James himself also argued against subjectivism and for the importance of "older truths" (that is, established facts), his writings led many others (including Peirce) to see his position as much more relativist and nominalist-leaning. James stressed the practical effects of belief and assertion, claiming that truth is a species of good (what it is ultimately good for us to believe). Much of James's philosophical work was aimed at dissolving many of the traditional philosophical puzzles and conundrums by showing that they made no practical difference in our lives or that they rested on mistaken and fruitless assumptions. For example, the traditional metaphysical concern of the nature of substance, as a category of things underlying and separable from attributes, has led to philosophers since the time of Plato to argue back and forth without any apparent solution. For James, the only significance of such an issue is what effect on our subsequent experience is likely to occur given the adoption of some position with respect to this issue. Likewise, any stance on, say, the existence of God, will matter only if adopting a belief (for or against such existence) will shape our future experience for the better. Since beliefs are instruments for coping with the world, those beliefs that are good for us, those that indeed help us cope, are the ones that are true. Of course, the goodness and coping-value of some beliefs might be negligible as in my beliefs that Romans wore socks while in Britain. The point for James is not the level or strength of goodness, but the appropriate criterion of truth and significance. While James, then, often focused on trying to dissolve long-standing philosophical puzzles, he also offered substantive positions on many issues. He argued for what is now called a compatibalist view of free will (that human freedom is compatible with some forms of determinism) as well as against a dualist view of mind. With respect to some traditional philosophical issues, e.g., freedom vs. determinism, he advocated a particular position because he did see predictable good or bad consequences. With respect to determinism, for example, he argued that a belief in determinism leads to a feeling of fatalism and a capitulation to the status quo; hence, it is not better for us.

In metaphysics, he is still known for his view of "radical empiricism," in which he argued that relations between objects are as real as the properties of objects. This view, he claimed, consisted in outline of a postulate, a statement of fact, and a generalized conclusion. The postulate is that the only things that shall be debatable among philosophers shall be things definable in terms drawn from experience. The statement of fact is that the relations between things are just as much matters of direct particular experience as the things themselves or their properties. For example, when one looks at a cat and a mouse, not only are those two objects (and their properties, such as their color and shape) immediate aspects of my visual experience, but so is the relation of their relative sizes; that is, it is also an aspect of my immediate visual experience that I see that the cat is larger than the mouse. Seeing the cat as being larger than the mouse is just as immediate as seeing that the cat is black and the mouse is gray. The generalized conclusion is that the parts of experience hold together from next to next by relations that are themselves parts of experience. As James puts it, the "directly apprehended universe needs, in short, no extraneous trans-empirical connective support, but possesses in its own right a concatenated or continuous structure."

Another metaphysical commitment of James is that of pluralism, i.e., that there is no single correct description or account of the world. With his consequentialist, future-oriented pragmatist view, focusing on effective possibilities, James argued that there can be multiple warranted or "true" accounts. Not only can there be different good accounts, but different correct accounts. In holding this view, James rejects a straight correspondence view of truth (what he calls "the copy theory") in which truth is simply a relation between a belief and a state of affairs. Rather, truth involves both a belief and facts about the world, but also other background beliefs and, indeed, future consequences. For James, then, the very distinction between a good account and a correct account is not a sharp dichotomy. This does not mean that any account is as good as any other; clearly that is false. Rather, there can be different accounts that not only make sense of present and past knowledge and experience, but lead to useful future experiences. What will determine the truth or warrantability of an account will be its consequences (e.g., are predictions based on it borne out in experience, does it promote physical and spiritual flourishing, does it survive intersubjective scrutiny?).

c. John Dewey

Born a generation after Peirce and James, and living decades past them both, John Dewey produced a body of work that reached a far greater audience than either of his predecessors. Like Peirce and James, Dewey engaged in academic philosophical writing, publishing many essays and books on metaphysics, epistemology, and value theory. Unlike Peirce and James, though, he also wrote a vast amount on social and political philosophy and very often engaged in dialogue outside of the academy. He became nationally known as an education reformer, frequently participating in public forums, and producing highly influential works such as Democracy and Education. His social and political writings, such as The Public and Its Problems, reached an audience far beyond academic philosophers. Within philosophy proper, Dewey is probably best known for his work on inquiry and logic. Stating that all inquiry is conducted by agents, and not merely by passive information processors, he emphasized the experimental and instrumental nature of human conduct. Taking inquiry to be "the controlled transformation of an indeterminate situation so as to convert the elements of the original situation into a unified whole," Dewey argued that logic, formal rules of inference and implication, are ultimately generalizations of warranted, or warrantable, conclusions. Logic is a species of inquiry, and the latter is never disinterested or free of valuation. This emphasis on purposeful interaction between agents and environments points to Dewey's well-known criticism of what he termed "the quest for certainty." Too much human activity (with philosophers being primary culprits) has been a search for absolutes, whether in the area of ontology, epistemology, or ethics. This, for Dewey, is mistaken. The world is filled with contingencies and is in flux. Human inquiry should be a matter of purposeful action in response to, and ultimately in anticipation of, such contingencies and change. Intelligence is experimental and evaluative; we learn by doing, by engagement with the puzzles and problems presented by a changing environment. While there might not be eternal, absolute standards or criteria for, say, moral judgment, it is also the case that there are criteria that transcend subjective preferences, since there are facts about the contingencies and problems we face.

Constantly and consistently stressing a naturalistic account of human activity, Dewey (like James) saw human inquiry as the entertainment of hypotheses and intelligence as evaluative. Preferring to call his philosophical approaches "instrumentalist" rather than “pragmatist,” Dewey emphasized the contingent, purposive nature of human action. This "learning-by-doing" view carried over into his metaphysical commitments. For example, he frequently stressed the position that an agent can only be fully understood as one pole in a person-environment interaction, not merely as a subject bumping into a world of objects. This carried over into more immediately practical areas, such as his educational theory. Here he strongly advocated formal schooling as a means to enhance the autonomy of persons, whereby that autonomy is understood as the ability of persons to frame purposes, plans and life goals along with the skills and abilities to carry those purposes and plans and goals into effect. An education that is relevant to meaningful experiences is one that recognizes and is based on two principles: a principle of continuity (we are temporal agents and today's experiences are part of a continuum with yesterday’s and tomorrow's) as well as a principle of interaction (we are social beings and one’s experiences are inherently and ineliminably interwoven with the experiences of others).

Frequently critiquing and rejecting dichotomies that he saw as unfounded and unsustainable, Dewey argued often against a fact/value dichotomy. What is good (or bad) is relative to contexts and goals, but at the same time is a matter of what helps an organism cope with and flourish in the world. Drawing from a Darwinian heritage and writing as an early proponent of what is now seen as evolutionary and naturalistic ethics, Dewey growth is the only moral end. Adaptation and adjustment to different and changing environments, including social and moral environments, are the signs of appropriate action. In the interaction with one's environments, an agent must decide among goals and choices of action, based on predicted outcomes. Appraising situations and deliberating on likely outcomes is what Dewey refers to as "valuation." This process of valuation, for Dewey, clearly demonstrates the useless and mistaken notion of a fact/value dichotomy.

Finally, along with arguing for valuation at the level of the individual organism or person, Dewey wrote voluminously on valuation at the level of the group or community. Often speaking of democracy as a way of life, he claimed that full self-realization requires community and emphasized this self-realization in the context of individuals' participation in social collectives. Social arrangements, in fact, are means of "creating" individuals, for Dewey, not oppressive or repressive impositions on them (at least, not by their nature; social arrangements could be oppressive and repressive, but not merely by being social). Social arrangements, far from being foreign impositions on our freedom, are both "natural" and can be enhancing of our individual freedom. Dewey fleshes out this claim by distinguishing two types of freedom: freedom of movement and freedom of intelligence. Freedom of movement is what some philosophers refer to by the expression "freedom from." To be free in this sense means that one is free from external constraints on one's movements. This, says Dewey, is certainly an important sense of freedom, but it is only a sense that is a means toward a more important end, which he designates as a fuller sort of freedom, namely, freedom of intelligence (or what some philosophers call "freedom to"). Simply having no (significant) external constraints on one's movements does not lead to or entail self-realization. As he put it in The Public and Its Problems: "No man and no mind was ever emancipated merely by being left alone." What one is free to do, what one does with that absence of constraint is a much more important sense of freedom for Dewey. He expresses this fuller sense of freedom is a variety of ways throughout his writings, e.g., it is "a sound instinct which identifies freedom with the power to frame purposes and to execute or carry into effect purposes so framed." Freedom of movement (that is, freedom from constraints) is a necessary, but on a necessary, condition for this fuller sense of freedom. Furthermore, this freedom of intelligence results not from living in isolation of in rejecting social constraints (or, in his wording, "social controls"). In fact, social controls are quite natural and self-directed, Dewey claims. For example, he says, watch children at play. One of the first things they will do is to establish rules and parameters for play, in order to make play possible. Games involve rules, which constrain action, but at the same time make meaningful action possible. The important point here is that these rules are not only accepted, but most often self-imposed by the children at play. In addition to being natural, freedom of intelligence, which incorporates social controls, is social in its nascence. For Dewey: "Liberty is that secure release and fulfillment of personal potentialities which take place only in rich and manifold association with others; the power to be an individualized self making a distinctive contribution and enjoying in its own way the fruits of association."

d. Other Pragmatists

Besides the "Big Three" classical pragmatists, there were many other important thinkers labeled (sometimes self-identified) as pragmatist. George Herbert Mead (1863-1931) was particularly influential during the first several decades of the twentieth century, especially in his work on the social development of the self and of language. A generation later, Clarence Irving Lewis (1883-1964) wrote several significant works in the middle third of the twentieth century on what he termed "conceptualistic pragmatism," stressing how pragmatic grounds shape the interpretation of experience. His contemporary, Alain Locke (1885-1954), blending the thought of earlier pragmatists with that of W.E.B. DuBois (1868-1963), produced a large body of work on the social construction of identity (particularly focusing on race) and advocating cultural pluralism within the context of what he called a philosophy of "critical relativism" or “critical pragmatism.”

Another important thinker, often labeled as pragmatist, but noted more for advocating an explicit version of philosophical idealism, was Josiah Royce (1855-1916). Though there were other American idealists (e.g., G. H. Howison of the St. Louis Hegelians and Bordon Parker Bowne (1847-1910), known for his view of "personalism"), Royce is recognized as the most influential of them. Epistemologically, Royce noted that any analysis of experience shows that the fact and, indeed, very possibility of error leads to the postulation of both mind and external reality, since only minds can be in error and being in error presupposes something about which mind can be mistaken. The recognition of error presupposes a higher level of awareness, since knowing that one is in error about X presupposes that one recognize both X and what is mistaken about one's judgment. Error, then, presupposes some form or level of veridicality. Much like the story of the blind men who come upon an elephant, each believing that part of the elephant captures the whole, the message here is that error is really partiality, that is having only partial truth. For Royce, this also pointed to the ultimate communal nature of all interpretation, as knowledge (even of one's self) comes from signs, which in turn require some kind of comparison and finally of community. Royce extended this view, and displayed definite affinities to pragmatism, in his analysis of meaning. The meaning of an idea, he claimed, contained both an external and an internal element, much as we say that terms have both a denotation and a connotation. Ideas have external meaning in the sense that they connect up to an external world. But they have an internal meaning in the sense that they embody or express purpose. What is real, Royce claimed, is "the complete embodiment in individual form and in final fulfillment, of the internal meaning of finite ideas." As these in turn require comparison and moving beyond partiality, they come finally to a complete and coherent absolute level of ideas, what he termed "Absolute Pragmatism."

4. 20th Century and Recent

Much of the philosophical work of the classic pragmatists, as well as that of Royce and others, though begun in the latter half of the nineteenth century, carried over into the early decades of the twentieth century. While pragmatism continued to be a dominant movement in American philosophy in these early decades, other movements and schools of thought emerged. In the first several decades, there was a revival of common sense realism and naturalism (or, put another way, an explicit rejection of what was seen as the idealism of Royce and some aspects of pragmatism) as well as the emergence of Process Philosophy, which was directly influenced by contemporary science, especially Einsteinian relativity theory. Mid-twentieth century philosophy was heavily dominated in America by empiricism and analytic philosophy, with a strong focus on language. Finally, in the latter couple of decades there was a re-discovery and revival of pragmatism as well as the emergence of feminist and "minority" issues and concerns, of people and groups who had been marginalized and under-represented throughout the nation's history. Some movements and schools of thought that had been prominent in Europe, such as existentialism and phenomenology, though having advocates in America, never gained significant widespread attention in American philosophy.

One of the earliest movements in twentieth century American thought was a rejection of idealism, spearheaded in large part by Royce's own student, George Santayana (1863-1952), who saw philosophy as having unfortunately abandoned, and in the case of idealism contradicted, common sense. If we push the concept of knowledge to the point of requiring indubitability, then skepticism is the result, since nothing will satisfy this requirement. On the other hand, if knowledge is a kind of faith, much as common sense rests on untested assumptions, then we are led to a view of "animal faith," which Santayana endorses. This return to common sense, or at least to a naturalist, realist stance was echoed by many philosophers at this time. In 1910 an essay in the Journal of Philosophy (then called the Journal of Philosophy, Psychology, and Scientific Methods), entitled, "The Program and First Platform of Six Realists," announced a strong reaction against idealism and what were seen idealist elements in pragmatism. Among the platform planks of this program were statements that objects exist independently of mind, that ontology is logically independent of epistemology, that epistemology is not logically fundamental (that is, that things are known directly to us), that the degree of unity, consistency, or connection subsisting among entities is a matter to be empirically ascertained, etc. Given this realist stance, these philosophers then proceeded to try to produce naturalistic accounts of philosophical matters, for example, Ralph Barton Perry's (1876-1957) General Theory of Value.

A second school of thought early in the century was known as "Process Philosophy." Identified largely with the work of Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947), though having other notable proponents such as Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000), process philosophy proceeded from an ontology that took events or processes as primary. Change and becoming were emphasized over permanence and being. Drawing on contemporary scientific advances, in particular the new Einsteinian worldview, Whitehead highlighted this "event ontology." In his well-known work, The Concept of Nature, he insisted that “nature is a structure of events," and taking the new Einsteinian four-dimensional understanding of the world, things (what he called "concresences") are merely those streams of events “which maintain permanence of character." This embracing of contemporary science did not entail a materialist stance for Whitehead any more than Jonathan Edwards's embracing of the Newtonian worldview entailed materialism on his part. Rather, Whitehead distinguished between the notion of "Nature lifeless" and “Nature alive,” with the latter an acknowledgement of value and purpose being just as basic to experience as an external world of events.

Despite the presence of these two movements and the still-present influence of pragmatism, the middle half of the twentieth century was dominated in America by empiricism and analytic philosophy, with a pronounced turn toward linguistic analysis. Beginning with the powerful influence of the Logical Positivists (or Logical Empiricists), most notably Rudolf Carnap (1891-1969), academic philosophy turned in a decided way away from social and political concerns to conceptual analysis and self-reflection (that is, to the question of just what the proper role of philosophy is). Without a doubt, the most influential American philosopher during this time was Willard Van Orman Quine (1908-2000). Though Quine was critical of many aspects of Logical Positivism, indeed, one of his most renowned essays was "Two Dogmas of Empiricism," he nevertheless shared their view that the role of philosophy was not to enlighten persons or serve social and political concerns. Saying that philosophers in the professional sense have no particular fitness for inspiration or "helping to get society on an even keel," he argued instead that philosophy's job is to clear away conceptual muddles and mistakes. Seeing philosophy as in large part continuous with science in the sense of trying to understand what there is and how we can then flourish in the world, he claimed that philosophy is on the abstract, theoretical end of scientific pursuits. Advocating a physicalist ontology, Quine was openly behaviorist about understanding human agency and knowledge. Criticizing the analytic/synthetic distinction and the view that there are truths independent of facts about the world, Quine strongly advocated a naturalized epistemology and naturalized ethics. Openly acknowledging an affinity with some aspects of pragmatism, Quine claimed a holistic approach to knowledge, insisting that no particular experiences occur in isolation; rather we experience a "web of belief," with every belief or statement or experience affecting “the field as a whole," and hence "our statements about the external world face the tribunal of sense experience not individually but only as a corporate body." Reminiscent of Dewey, Quine asserted that while there is no fact/value dichotomy, the sciences, with their system of checks and balances, do provide the best theories and models of what there is. Besides his commitment to materialism, behaviorism, and holism, Quine urged what he called "semantic ascent," that is, that philosophy should proceed by focusing on an analysis of language. By looking at the language we use and by framing philosophical concerns in terms of language, we can avoid fruitless philosophical disputes and faulty ontological commitments. Within academic philosophy, Quine is perhaps best known for his work in formal, mathematical logic and with his doctrine of "the indeterminacy of translation." In his highly influential book, Word and Object, he introduced the term "gavagai." “Gavagai” is a term uttered by a native while pointing at something in the immediate environment, something that appears to us as a rabbit. However, from that utterance, we don't know if "gavagai" should be translated into English as “rabbit” or “undetached rabbit parts” or "rabbit time-slice" or something else. The point is that there is no givenness to the situation, no determinateness of translation. Nor is this a simple matter, as this lack of givenness and determinacy holds in all situations. There are other, pragmatic, factors that allow communication and understanding to be possible.

With this formal, often extremely technical, conceptual analysis dominating mid-century American philosophy, a return to social and political concerns did not become mainstream again until the 1970s. Such a return is often credited to the publication of John Rawls's (1921-2002) A Theory of Justice. While other philosophers had, of course, written on these issues, it was Rawls's book that brought these topics back into mainstream consideration among professional philosophers. Rawls argued for a position of political liberalism based on a system of procedural justice. Though his work was widely influential, it was critiqued by philosophers identified as libertarian, such as Robert Nozick (1938-2002), who saw it as too restrictive of individual liberties, as well as by communitarians, such as Alasdair MacIntyre (1929- ) who saw it as focusing too much on procedural justice and not enough on what is good for persons, who are also citizens situated in communities. Still, the revival of substantive social and political philosophy was effected. Outside of academic philosophy, these concerns had not been absent, however, but were present in the writings of social and political leaders, and in popular political philosophy, such as the writings of Ayn Rand (1905-1982) and Martin Luther King, Jr. (1929-1968).

As the century ended, there was a renewal of interest in pragmatism as a philosophical movement, with two important philosophers in particular adopting the label of pragmatist, Hilary Putnam (1926- ) and Richard Rorty (1931- ). Known throughout the philosophical world, they brought the writings and stance of classical pragmatists back into the forefront of professional philosophy, often with their critiques of each other's works. This renewal of pragmatism, along with the revival of social and political philosophy, came at the same time, the final quarter of the century, as feminist philosophy emerged, though there had been prominent feminist thinkers in American philosophy prior to this time, e.g., Grimké and Stanton, noted earlier, as well as others, such as Charlotte Perkins Gilman (1860-1935) or even Anne Hutchinson (1591-1643). Outside of academic philosophy, the publication, in the 1960s, of Betty Friedan's The Feminine Mystique, struck a popular nerve about the marginalization of women. Inside academic philosophy, feminist philosophers, such as Adrienne Rich (1929- ) and many others, began critiques of traditional philosophical concerns and stances. These critiques were leveled at the very roots of philosophical issues and across the board. For example, there were critiques of epistemic values such as objectivity (that is, detached, disembodied inquiry), as well as what were taken as masculine approaches to ethics and political philosophy, such as procedural over substantive justice or rights-based ethical theories. Insisting that there was not a public/private dichotomy and no value-neutral inquiry, feminists reformulated philosophical issues and concerns and redirected philosophical attention to issues of power and the social dimensions (and construction) of those very issues and concerns. This demand for pluralism in content was expanded to philosophical methods and goals, generally, and was expanded to other traditionally marginalized perspectives. By century's end, traditional philosophical work continued in full force, for example, with a strong surge of interest in philosophy of mind, philosophy of science, etc., but was accompanied at the same time by a sharp increase in these newly-demanded foci, such as philosophy of race, philosophy of law, philosophy of power, etc.

One final note. This survey of American Philosophy clearly is all-too-brief. One difficulty with summarizing American Philosophy is what has counted as philosophy over time. Unlike European cultures, there has tended to be less of an academic class in America, hence less of a sense of professional philosophy, until, that is, the twentieth century. Even then, much of what has been taken as philosophy by most Americans has been distant from what most professional philosophers have taken as philosophy. The kind of public awareness in France and indeed Europe as a whole of, say, the death of Jean-Paul Sartre, was nowhere near matched in America by the death of Quine, though for professional philosophers the latter was at least of equal stature. Few American philosophers have had the social impact outside of academia as John Dewey. A second difficulty here is that many thinkers in American intellectual history lie outside what is today considered philosophy. Because of his intellectual lineage, Jonathan Edwards is still studied within American Philosophy, but other important American thinkers, such as Reinhold Niebuhr (1892-1971) and C. Wright Mills (1916-1962) are not. Much as other academic disciplines, philosophy in America has become professionalized. Nevertheless, professional philosophers, for example in their analysis of rights and the question of the meaningfulness of animal rights, or in their application of philosophical ethics to health care contexts, have both reflected and shaped the face of American culture.

5. References and Further Reading

There are numerous works available on particular American philosophers and specific movements or philosophical traditions in American philosophy. The references below are for books that deal widely with American Philosophy as a whole.

  • Blau, Joseph L. Men and Movements in American Philosophy. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, 1952.
  • Borradori, Giovanna. The American Philosopher. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1994.
  • Cohen, Morris. American Thought. Glencoe, IL: The Free Press, 1954.
  • Fisch, Max H. (ed.). Classic American Philosophers. New York: Appelton-Century-Crofts, 1951.
  • Flower, Elizabeth and Murray G. Murphy. A History of Philosophy in American, two volumes. New York: G. P. Putnam's Sons, 1977.
  • Hollinger, David A. and Charles Capper. The American Intellectual Tradition, two volumes. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989. (Second edition, 1993.)
  • Harris, Leonard. Philosophy Born of Struggle: Anthology of African American Philosophy from 1917. Dubuque, IO: Kendell/Hunt, 1983.
  • Harris, Leonard, Scott L. Pratt, and Anne S. Waters (eds.). American Philosophies. Oxford: Blackwell, 2002.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. A History of Philosophy in American, 1720-2000. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. The Rise of American Philosophy: Cambridge, Massachusetts, 1860-1930. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1977.
  • MacKinnon, Barbara (ed.). American Philosophy: A Historical Anthology. Albany: SUNY Press, 1985.
  • Muelder, Walter G., Laurence Sears and Anne V. Schlabach (eds.). The Develolpment of American Philosophy. New York: Houghton Mifflin, 1940. (Second edition, 1960.)
  • Myers, Gerald (ed.). The Spirit of American Philosophy. New York: Capricorn Books, 1971.
  • Pratt, Scott L. Native Pragmatism. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2002.
  • Reck, Andrew J. The New American Philosophers. New York: Dell, 1968.
  • Reck, Andrew J. Recent American Philosophy. New York: Pantheon Books, 1964.
  • Schneider, Herbert W. A History of American Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1946.
  • Singer, Marcus G. (ed.) American Philosophy. Cambridge: Royal Institute of Philosophy, 1985.
  • Smith, John E. The Spirit of American Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 1963.
  • Smith, John E. Themes in American Philosophy. New York: Harper & Row, 1970.
  • Stanlick, Nancy A. and Bruce S. Silver (eds.). Philosophy in America: Primary Readings. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson Prentice Hall, 2004.
  • Stroh, Guy W. American Philosophy. Princeton: D. Van Nostrand, 1968.
  • Stuhr, John J. (ed.). Classical American Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Stuhr, John J. (ed.). Pragmatism and Classical American Philosophy, second edition. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Waters, Anne S. American Indian Thought. Oxford: Blackwell, 2003.
  • West, Cornell. The American Evasion of Philosophy. Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1989.
  • White, Morton (ed.). Documents in the History of American Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • White, Morton. Science and Sentiment in America. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • Winn, Ralph B. (ed.). American Philosophy. New York: Greenwood Press, 1968.

Author Information

David Boersema
Email: boersema@pacificu.edu
Pacific University
U. S. A.

John Dewey (1859—1952)

deweyJohn Dewey was a leading proponent of the American school of thought known as pragmatism, a view that rejected the dualistic epistemology and metaphysics of modern philosophy in favor of a naturalistic approach that viewed knowledge as arising from an active adaptation of the human organism to its environment. On this view, inquiry should not be understood as consisting of a mind passively observing the world and drawing from this ideas that if true correspond to reality, but rather as a process which initiates with a check or obstacle to successful human action, proceeds to active manipulation of the environment to test hypotheses, and issues in a re-adaptation of organism to environment that allows once again for human action to proceed. With this view as his starting point, Dewey developed a broad body of work encompassing virtually all of the main areas of philosophical concern in his day. He also wrote extensively on social issues in such popular publications as the New Republic, thereby gaining a reputation as a leading social commentator of his time.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Theory of Knowledge
  3. Metaphysics
  4. Ethical and Social Theory
  5. Aesthetics
  6. Critical Reception and Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

John Dewey was born on October 20, 1859, the third of four sons born to Archibald Sprague Dewey and Lucina Artemesia Rich of Burlington, Vermont. The eldest sibling died in infancy, but the three surviving brothers attended the public school and the University of Vermont in Burlington with John. While at the University of Vermont, Dewey was exposed to evolutionary theory through the teaching of G.H. Perkins and Lessons in Elementary Physiology, a text by T.H. Huxley, the famous English evolutionist. The theory of natural selection continued to have a life-long impact upon Dewey's thought, suggesting the barrenness of static models of nature, and the importance of focusing on the interaction between the human organism and its environment when considering questions of psychology and the theory of knowledge. The formal teaching in philosophy at the University of Vermont was confined for the most part to the school of Scottish realism, a school of thought that Dewey soon rejected, but his close contact both before and after graduation with his teacher of philosophy, H.A.P. Torrey, a learned scholar with broader philosophical interests and sympathies, was later accounted by Dewey himself as "decisive" to his philosophical development.

After graduation in 1879, Dewey taught high school for two years, during which the idea of pursuing a career in philosophy took hold. With this nascent ambition in mind, he sent a philosophical essay to W.T. Harris, then editor of the Journal of Speculative Philosophy, and the most prominent of the St. Louis Hegelians. Harris's acceptance of the essay gave Dewey the confirmation he needed of his promise as a philosopher. With this encouragement he traveled to Baltimore to enroll as a graduate student at Johns Hopkins University.

At Johns Hopkins Dewey came under the tutelage of two powerful and engaging intellects who were to have a lasting influence on him. George Sylvester Morris, a German-trained Hegelian philosopher, exposed Dewey to the organic model of nature characteristic of German idealism. G. Stanley Hall, one of the most prominent American experimental psychologists at the time, provided Dewey with an appreciation of the power of scientific methodology as applied to the human sciences. The confluence of these viewpoints propelled Dewey's early thought, and established the general tenor of his ideas throughout his philosophical career.

Upon obtaining his doctorate in 1884, Dewey accepted a teaching post at the University of Michigan, a post he was to hold for ten years, with the exception of a year at the University of Minnesota in 1888. While at Michigan Dewey wrote his first two books: Psychology (1887), and Leibniz's New Essays Concerning the Human Understanding (1888). Both works expressed Dewey's early commitment to Hegelian idealism, while the Psychology explored the synthesis between this idealism and experimental science that Dewey was then attempting to effect. At Michigan Dewey also met one of his important philosophical collaborators, James Hayden Tufts, with whom he would later author Ethics (1908; revised ed. 1932).

In 1894, Dewey followed Tufts to the recently founded University of Chicago. It was during his years at Chicago that Dewey's early idealism gave way to an empirically based theory of knowledge that was in concert with the then developing American school of thought known as pragmatism. This change in view finally coalesced into a series of four essays entitled collectively "Thought and its Subject-Matter," which was published along with a number of other essays by Dewey's colleagues and students at Chicago under the title Studies in Logical Theory (1903). Dewey also founded and directed a laboratory school at Chicago, where he was afforded an opportunity to apply directly his developing ideas on pedagogical method. This experience provided the material for his first major work on education, The School and Society (1899).

Disagreements with the administration over the status of the Laboratory School led to Dewey's resignation from his post at Chicago in 1904. His philosophical reputation now secured, he was quickly invited to join the Department of Philosophy at Columbia University. Dewey spent the rest of his professional life at Columbia. Now in New York, located in the midst of the Northeastern universities that housed many of the brightest minds of American philosophy, Dewey developed close contacts with many philosophers working from divergent points of view, an intellectually stimulating atmosphere which served to nurture and enrich his thought.

During his first decade at Columbia Dewey wrote a great number of articles in the theory of knowledge and metaphysics, many of which were published in two important books: The Influence of Darwin on Philosophy and Other Essays in Contemporary Thought (1910) and Essays in Experimental Logic(1916). His interest in educational theory also continued during these years, fostered by his work at Teachers College at Columbia. This led to the publication of How We Think (1910; revised ed. 1933), an application of his theory of knowledge to education, and Democracy and Education (1916), perhaps his most important work in the field.

During his years at Columbia Dewey's reputation grew not only as a leading philosopher and educational theorist, but also in the public mind as an important commentator on contemporary issues, the latter due to his frequent contributions to popular magazines such as The New Republic and Nation, as well as his ongoing political involvement in a variety of causes, such as women's suffrage and the unionization of teachers. One outcome of this fame was numerous invitations to lecture in both academic and popular venues. Many of his most significant writings during these years were the result of such lectures, includingReconstruction in Philosophy (1920), Human Nature and Conduct (1922), Experience and Nature(1925), The Public and its Problems (1927), and The Quest for Certainty (1929).

Dewey's retirement from active teaching in 1930 did not curtail his activity either as a public figure or productive philosopher. Of special note in his public life was his participation in the Commission of Inquiry into the Charges Against Leon Trotsky at the Moscow Trial, which exposed Stalin's political machinations behind the Moscow trials of the mid-1930s, and his defense of fellow philosopher Bertrand Russell against an attempt by conservatives to remove him from his chair at the College of the City of New York in 1940. A primary focus of Dewey's philosophical pursuits during the 1930s was the preparation of a final formulation of his logical theory, published as Logic: The Theory of Inquiry in 1938. Dewey's other significant works during his retirement years include Art as Experience (1934), A Common Faith(1934), Freedom and Culture (1939), Theory of Valuation (1939), and Knowing and the Known(1949), the last coauthored with Arthur F. Bentley. Dewey continued to work vigorously throughout his retirement until his death on June 2, 1952, at the age of ninety-two.

2. Theory of Knowledge

The central focus of Dewey's philosophical interests throughout his career was what has been traditionally called "epistemology," or the "theory of knowledge." It is indicative, however, of Dewey's critical stance toward past efforts in this area that he expressly rejected the term "epistemology," preferring the "theory of inquiry" or "experimental logic" as more representative of his own approach.

In Dewey's view, traditional epistemologies, whether rationalist or empiricist, had drawn too stark a distinction between thought, the domain of knowledge, and the world of fact to which thought purportedly referred: thought was believed to exist apart from the world, epistemically as the object of immediate awareness, ontologically as the unique aspect of the self. The commitment of modern rationalism, stemming from Descartes, to a doctrine of innate ideas, ideas constituted from birth in the very nature of the mind itself, had effected this dichotomy; but the modern empiricists, beginning with Locke, had done the same just as markedly by their commitment to an introspective methodology and a representational theory of ideas. The resulting view makes a mystery of the relevance of thought to the world: if thought constitutes a domain that stands apart from the world, how can its accuracy as an account of the world ever be established? For Dewey a new model, rejecting traditional presumptions, was wanting, a model that Dewey endeavored to develop and refine throughout his years of writing and reflection.

In his early writings on these issues, such as "Is Logic a Dualistic Science?" (1890) and "The Present Position of Logical Theory" (1891), Dewey offered a solution to epistemological issues mainly along the lines of his early acceptance of Hegelian idealism: the world of fact does not stand apart from thought, but is itself defined within thought as its objective manifestation. But during the succeeding decade Dewey gradually came to reject this solution as confused and inadequate.

A number of influences have bearing on Dewey's change of view. For one, Hegelian idealism was not conducive to accommodating the methodologies and results of experimental science which he accepted and admired. Dewey himself had attempted to effect such an accommodation between experimental psychology and idealism in his early Psychology (1887), but the publication of William James' Principles of Psychology (1891), written from a more thoroughgoing naturalistic stance, suggested the superfluity of idealist principles in the treatment of the subject.

Second, Darwin's theory of natural selection suggested in a more particular way the form which a naturalistic approach to the theory of knowledge should take. Darwin's theory had renounced supernatural explanations of the origins of species by accounting for the morphology of living organisms as a product of a natural, temporal process of the adaptation of lineages of organisms to their environments, environments which, Darwin understood, were significantly determined by the organisms that occupied them. The key to the naturalistic account of species was a consideration of the complex interrelationships between organisms and environments. In a similar way, Dewey came to believe that a productive, naturalistic approach to the theory of knowledge must begin with a consideration of the development of knowledge as an adaptive human response to environing conditions aimed at an active restructuring of these conditions. Unlike traditional approaches in the theory of knowledge, which saw thought as a subjective primitive out of which knowledge was composed, Dewey's approach understood thought genetically, as the product of the interaction between organism and environment, and knowledge as having practical instrumentality in the guidance and control of that interaction. Thus Dewey adopted the term "instrumentalism" as a descriptive appellation for his new approach.

Dewey's first significant application of this new naturalistic understanding was offered in his seminal article "The Reflex Arc Concept in Psychology" (1896). In this article, Dewey argued that the dominant conception of the reflex arc in the psychology of his day, which was thought to begin with the passive stimulation of the organism, causing a conscious act of awareness eventuating in a response, was a carry-over of the old, and errant, mind-body dualism. Dewey argued for an alternative view: the organism interacts with the world through self-guided activity that coordinates and integrates sensory and motor responses. The implication for the theory of knowledge was clear: the world is not passively perceived and thereby known; active manipulation of the environment is involved integrally in the process of learning from the start.

Dewey first applied this interactive naturalism in an explicit manner to the theory of knowledge in his four introductory essays in Studies in Logical Theory. Dewey identified the view expressed in Studies with the school of pragmatism, crediting William James as its progenitor. James, for his part, in an article appearing in the Psychological Bulletin, proclaimed the work as the expression of a new school of thought, acknowledging its originality.

A detailed genetic analysis of the process of inquiry was Dewey's signal contribution to Studies. Dewey distinguished three phases of the process. It begins with the problematic situation, a situation where instinctive or habitual responses of the human organism to the environment are inadequate for the continuation of ongoing activity in pursuit of the fulfillment of needs and desires. Dewey stressed inStudies and subsequent writings that the uncertainty of the problematic situation is not inherently cognitive, but practical and existential. Cognitive elements enter into the process as a response to precognitive maladjustment.

The second phase of the process involves the isolation of the data or subject matter which defines the parameters within which the reconstruction of the initiating situation must be addressed. In the third, reflective phase of the process, the cognitive elements of inquiry (ideas, suppositions, theories, etc.) are entertained as hypothetical solutions to the originating impediment of the problematic situation, the implications of which are pursued in the abstract. The final test of the adequacy of these solutions comes with their employment in action. If a reconstruction of the antecedent situation conducive to fluid activity is achieved, then the solution no longer retains the character of the hypothetical that marks cognitive thought; rather, it becomes a part of the existential circumstances of human life.

The error of modern epistemologists, as Dewey saw it, was that they isolated the reflective stages of this process, and hypostatized the elements of those stages (sensations, ideas, etc.) into pre-existing constituents of a subjective mind in their search for an incorrigible foundation of knowledge. For Dewey, the hypostatization was as groundless as the search for incorrigibility was barren. Rejecting foundationalism, Dewey accepted the fallibilism that was characteristic of the school of pragmatism: the view that any proposition accepted as an item of knowledge has this status only provisionally, contingent upon its adequacy in providing a coherent understanding of the world as the basis for human action.

Dewey defended this general outline of the process of inquiry throughout his long career, insisting that it was the only proper way to understand the means by which we attain knowledge, whether it be the commonsense knowledge that guides the ordinary affairs of our lives, or the sophisticated knowledge arising from scientific inquiry. The latter is only distinguished from the former by the precision of its methods for controlling data, and the refinement of its hypotheses. In his writings in the theory of inquiry subsequent to Studies, Dewey endeavored to develop and deepen instrumentalism by considering a number of central issues of traditional epistemology from its perspective, and responding to some of the more trenchant criticisms of the view.

One traditional question that Dewey addressed in a series of essays between 1906 and 1909 was that of the meaning of truth. Dewey at that time considered the pragmatic theory of truth as central to the pragmatic school of thought, and vigorously defended its viability. Both Dewey and William James, in his book Pragmatism (1907), argued that the traditional correspondence theory of truth, according to which the true idea is one that agrees or corresponds to reality, only begs the question of what the "agreement" or "correspondence" of idea with reality is. Dewey and James maintained that an idea agrees with reality, and is therefore true, if and only if it is successfully employed in human action in pursuit of human goals and interests, that is, if it leads to the resolution of a problematic situation in Dewey's terms. The pragmatic theory of truth met with strong opposition among its critics, perhaps most notably from the British logician and philosopher Bertrand Russell. Dewey later began to suspect that the issues surrounding the conditions of truth, as well as knowledge, were hopelessly obscured by the accretion of traditional, and in his view misguided, meanings to the terms, resulting in confusing ambiguity. He later abandoned these terms in favor of "warranted assertiblity" to describe the distinctive property of ideas that results from successful inquiry.

One of the most important developments of his later writings in the theory of knowledge was the application of the principles of instrumentalism to the traditional conceptions and formal apparatus of logical theory. Dewey made significant headway in this endeavor in his lengthy introduction to Essays in Experimental Logic, but the project reached full fruition in Logic: The Theory of Inquiry.

The basis of Dewey's discussion in the Logic is the continuity of intelligent inquiry with the adaptive responses of pre-human organisms to their environments in circumstances that check efficient activity in the fulfillment of organic needs. What is distinctive about intelligent inquiry is that it is facilitated by the use of language, which allows, by its symbolic meanings and implication relationships, the hypothetical rehearsal of adaptive behaviors before their employment under actual, prevailing conditions for the purpose of resolving problematic situations. Logical form, the specialized subject matter of traditional logic, owes its genesis not to rational intuition, as had often been assumed by logicians, but due to its functional value in (1) managing factual evidence pertaining to the problematic situation that elicits inquiry, and (2) controlling the procedures involved in the conceptualized entertainment of hypothetical solutions. As Dewey puts it, "logical forms accrue to subject-matter when the latter is subjected to controlled inquiry."

From this new perspective, Dewey reconsiders many of the topics of traditional logic, such as the distinction between deductive and inductive inference, propositional form, and the nature of logical necessity. One important outcome of this work was a new theory of propositions. Traditional views in logic had held that the logical import of propositions is defined wholly by their syntactical form (e.g., "All As are Bs," "Some Bs are Cs"). In contrast, Dewey maintained that statements of identical propositional form can play significantly different functional roles in the process of inquiry. Thus in keeping with his distinction between the factual and conceptual elements of inquiry, he replaced the accepted distinctions between universal, particular, and singular propositions based on syntactical meaning with a distinction between existential and ideational propositions, a distinction that largely cuts across traditional classifications. The same general approach is taken throughout the work: the aim is to offer functional analyses of logical principles and techniques that exhibit their operative utility in the process of inquiry as Dewey understood it.

The breadth of topics treated and the depth and continuity of the discussion of these topics mark theLogic as Dewey's decisive statement in logical theory. The recognition of the work's importance within the philosophical community of the time can be gauged by the fact that the Journal of Philosophy, the most prominent American journal in the field, dedicated an entire issue to a discussion of the work, including contributions by such philosophical luminaries as C. I. Lewis of Harvard University, and Ernest Nagel, Dewey's colleague at Columbia University. Although many of his critics did question, and continue to question, the assumptions of his approach, one that is certainly unique in the development of twentieth century logical theory, there is no doubt that the work was and continues to be an important contribution to the field.

3. Metaphysics

Dewey's naturalistic metaphysics first took shape in articles that he wrote during the decade after the publication of Studies in Logical Theory, a period when he was attempting to elucidate the implications of instrumentalism. Dewey disagreed with William James's assessment that pragmatic principles were metaphysically neutral. (He discusses this disagreement in "What Does Pragmatism Mean by Practical," published in 1908.) Dewey's view was based in part on an assessment of the motivations behind traditional metaphysics: a central aim of the metaphysical tradition had been the discovery of an immutable cognitive object that could serve as a foundation for knowledge. The pragmatic theory, by showing that knowledge is a product of an activity directed to the fulfillment of human purposes, and that a true (or warranted) belief is known to be such by the consequences of its employment rather than by any psychological or ontological foundations, rendered this longstanding aim of metaphysics, in Dewey's view, moot, and opened the door to renewed metaphysical discussion grounded firmly on an empirical basis.

Dewey begins to define the general form that an empirical metaphysics should take in a number of articles, including "The Postulate of Immediate Empiricism" (1905) and "Does Reality Possess Practical Character?" (1908). In the former article, Dewey asserts that things experienced empirically "are what they are experienced as." Dewey uses as an example a noise heard in a darkened room that is initially experienced as fearsome. Subsequent inquiry (e.g., turning on the lights and looking about) reveals that the noise was caused by a shade tapping against a window, and thus innocuous. But the subsequent inquiry, Dewey argues, does not change the initial status of the noise: it was experienced as fearsome, and in fact was fearsome. The point stems from the naturalistic roots of Dewey's logic. Our experience of the world is constituted by our interrelationship with it, a relationship that is imbued with practical import. The initial fearsomeness of the noise is the experiential correlate of the uncertain, problematic character of the situation, an uncertainty that is not merely subjective or mental, but a product of the potential inadequacy of previously established modes of behavior to deal effectively with the pragmatic demands of present circumstances. The subsequent inquiry does not, therefore, uncover a reality (the innocuousness of the noise) underlying a mere appearance (its fearsomeness), but by settling the demands of the situation, it effects a change in the inter-dynamics of the organism-environment relationship of the initial situation--a change in reality.

There are two important implications of this line of thought that distinguish it from the metaphysical tradition. First, although inquiry is aimed at resolving the precarious and confusing aspects of experience to provide a stable basis for action, this does not imply the unreality of the unstable and contingent, nor justify its relegation to the status of mere appearance. Thus, for example, the usefulness and reliability of utilizing certain stable features of things encountered in our experience as a basis for classification does not justify according ultimate reality to essences or Platonic forms any more than, as rationalist metaphysicians in the modern era have thought, the similar usefulness of mathematical reasoning in understanding natural processes justifies the conclusion that the world can be exhaustively defined mathematically.

Second, the fact that the meanings we attribute to natural events might change in any particular in the future as renewed inquiries lead to more adequate understandings of natural events (as was implied by Dewey's fallibilism) does not entail that our experience of the world at any given time may as a whole be errant. Thus the implicit skepticism that underlies the representational theory of ideas and raises questions concerning the veracity of perceptual experience as such is unwarranted. Dewey stresses the point that sensations, hypotheses, ideas, etc., come into play to mediate our encounter with the world only in the context of active inquiry. Once inquiry is successful in resolving a problematic situation, mediatory sensations and ideas, as Dewey says, "drop out; and things are present to the agent in the most naively realistic fashion."

These contentions positioned Dewey's metaphysics within the territory of a naive realism, and in a number of his articles, such as "The Realism of Pragmatism" (1905), "Brief Studies in Realism" (1911), and "The Existence of the World as a Logical Problem" (1915), it is this view that Dewey expressly avows (a view that he carefully distinguishes from what he calls "presentational realism," which he attributes to a number of the other realists of his day). Opposing narrow-minded positions that would accord full ontological status only to certain, typically the most stable or reliable, aspects of experience, Dewey argues for a position that recognizes the real significance of the multifarious richness of human experience.

Dewey offered a fuller statement of his metaphysics in 1925, with the publication of one of his most significant philosophical works, Experience and Nature. In the introductory chapter, Dewey stresses a familiar theme from his earlier writings: that previous metaphysicians, guided by unavowed biases for those aspects of experience that are relatively stable and secure, have illicitly reified these biases into narrow ontological presumptions, such as the temporal identity of substance, or the ultimate reality of forms or essences. Dewey finds this procedure so pervasive in the history of thought that he calls it simplythe philosophic fallacy, and signals his intention to eschew the disastrous consequences of this approach by offering a descriptive account of all of the various generic features of human experience, whatever their character.

Dewey begins with the observation that the world as we experience it both individually and collectively is an admixture of the precarious, the transitory and contingent aspect of things, and the stable, the patterned regularity of natural processes that allows for prediction and human intervention. Honest metaphysical description must take into account both of these elements of experience. Dewey endeavors to do this by an event ontology. The world, rather than being comprised of things or, in more traditional terms, substances, is comprised of happenings or occurrences that admit of both episodic uniqueness and general, structured order. Intrinsically events have an ineffable qualitative character by which they are immediately enjoyed or suffered, thus providing the basis for experienced value and aesthetic appreciation. Extrinsically events are connected to one another by patterns of change and development; any given event arises out of determinant prior conditions and leads to probable consequences. The patterns of these temporal processes is the proper subject matter of human knowledge--we know the world in terms of causal laws and mathematical relationships--but the instrumental value of understanding and controlling them should not blind us to the immediate, qualitative aspect of events; indeed, the value of scientific understanding is most significantly realized in the facility it affords for controlling the circumstances under which immediate enjoyments may be realized.

It is in terms of the distinction between qualitative immediacy and the structured order of events that Dewey understands the general pattern of human life and action. This understanding is captured by James' suggestive metaphor that human experience consists of an alternation of flights and perchings, an alternation of concentrated effort directed toward the achievement of foreseen aims, what Dewey calls "ends-in-view," with the fruition of effort in the immediate satisfaction of "consummatory experience." Dewey's insistence that human life follows the patterns of nature, as a part of nature, is the core tenet of his naturalistic outlook.

Dewey also addresses the social aspect of human experience facilitated by symbolic activity, particularly that of language. For Dewey the question of the nature of social relationships is a significant matter not only for social theory, but metaphysics as well, for it is from collective human activity, and specifically the development of shared meanings that govern this activity, that the mind arises. Thus rather than understanding the mind as a primitive and individual human endowment, and a precondition of conscious and intentional action, as was typical in the philosophical tradition since Descartes, Dewey offers a genetic analysis of mind as an emerging aspect of cooperative activity mediated by linguistic communication. Consciousness, in turn, is not to be understood as a domain of private awareness, but rather as the fulcrum point of the organism's readjustment to the challenge of novel conditions where the meanings and attitudes that formulate habitual behavioral responses to the environment fail to be adequate. Thus Dewey offers in the better part of a number of chapters of Experience and Nature a response to the traditional mind-body problem of the metaphysical tradition, a response that understands the mind as an emergent issue of natural processes, more particularly the web of interactive relationships between human beings and the world in which they live.

4. Ethical and Social Theory

Dewey's mature thought in ethics and social theory is not only intimately linked to the theory of knowledge in its founding conceptual framework and naturalistic standpoint, but also complementary to it in its emphasis on the social dimension of inquiry both in its processes and its consequences. In fact, it would be reasonable to claim that Dewey's theory of inquiry cannot be fully understood either in the meaning of its central tenets or the significance of its originality without considering how it applies to social aims and values, the central concern of his ethical and social theory.

Dewey rejected the atomistic understanding of society of the Hobbesian social contract theory, according to which the social, cooperative aspect of human life was grounded in the logically prior and fully articulated rational interests of individuals. Dewey's claim in Experience and Nature that the collection of meanings that constitute the mind have a social origin expresses the basic contention, one that he maintained throughout his career, that the human individual is a social being from the start, and that individual satisfaction and achievement can be realized only within the context of social habits and institutions that promote it.

Moral and social problems, for Dewey, are concerned with the guidance of human action to the achievement of socially defined ends that are productive of a satisfying life for individuals within the social context. Regarding the nature of what constitutes a satisfying life, Dewey was intentionally vague, out of his conviction that specific ends or goods can be defined only in particular socio-historical contexts. In theEthics (1932) he speaks of the ends simply as the cultivation of interests in goods that recommend themselves in the light of calm reflection. In other works, such as Human Nature and Conduct and Art as Experience, he speaks of (1) the harmonizing of experience (the resolution of conflicts of habit and interest both within the individual and within society), (2) the release from tedium in favor of the enjoyment of variety and creative action, and (3) the expansion of meaning (the enrichment of the individual's appreciation of his or her circumstances within human culture and the world at large). The attunement of individual efforts to the promotion of these social ends constitutes, for Dewey, the central issue of ethical concern of the individual; the collective means for their realization is the paramount question of political policy.

Conceived in this manner, the appropriate method for solving moral and social questions is the same as that required for solving questions concerning matters of fact: an empirical method that is tied to an examination of problematic situations, the gathering of relevant facts, and the imaginative consideration of possible solutions that, when utilized, bring about a reconstruction and resolution of the original situations. Dewey, throughout his ethical and social writings, stressed the need for an open-ended, flexible, and experimental approach to problems of practice aimed at the determination of the conditions for the attainment of human goods and a critical examination of the consequences of means adopted to promote them, an approach that he called the "method of intelligence."

The central focus of Dewey's criticism of the tradition of ethical thought is its tendency to seek solutions to moral and social problems in dogmatic principles and simplistic criteria which in his view were incapable of dealing effectively with the changing requirements of human events. In Reconstruction of Philosophyand The Quest for Certainty, Dewey located the motivation of traditional dogmatic approaches in philosophy in the forlorn hope for security in an uncertain world, forlorn because the conservatism of these approaches has the effect of inhibiting the intelligent adaptation of human practice to the ineluctable changes in the physical and social environment. Ideals and values must be evaluated with respect to their social consequences, either as inhibitors or as valuable instruments for social progress, and Dewey argues that philosophy, because of the breadth of its concern and its critical approach, can play a crucial role in this evaluation.

In large part, then, Dewey's ideas in ethics and social theory were programmatic rather than substantive, defining the direction that he believed human thought and action must take in order to identify the conditions that promote the human good in its fullest sense, rather than specifying particular formulae or principles for individual and social action. He studiously avoided participating in what he regarded as the unfortunate practice of previous moral philosophers of offering general rules that legislate universal standards of conduct. But there are strong suggestions in a number of his works of basic ethical and social positions. In Human Nature and Conduct Dewey approaches ethical inquiry through an analysis of human character informed by the principles of scientific psychology. The analysis is reminiscent of Aristotelian ethics, concentrating on the central role of habit in formulating the dispositions of action that comprise character, and the importance of reflective intelligence as a means of modifying habits and controlling disruptive desires and impulses in the pursuit of worthwhile ends.

The social condition for the flexible adaptation that Dewey believed was crucial for human advancement is a democratic form of life, not instituted merely by democratic forms of governance, but by the inculcation of democratic habits of cooperation and public spiritedness, productive of an organized, self-conscious community of individuals responding to society's needs by experimental and inventive, rather than dogmatic, means. The development of these democratic habits, Dewey argues in School and Society andDemocracy and Education, must begin in the earliest years of a child's educational experience. Dewey rejected the notion that a child's education should be viewed as merely a preparation for civil life, during which disjoint facts and ideas are conveyed by the teacher and memorized by the student only to be utilized later on. The school should rather be viewed as an extension of civil society and continuous with it, and the student encouraged to operate as a member of a community, actively pursuing interests in cooperation with others. It is by a process of self-directed learning, guided by the cultural resources provided by teachers, that Dewey believed a child is best prepared for the demands of responsible membership within the democratic community.

5. Aesthetics

Dewey's one significant treatment of aesthetic theory is offered in Art as Experience, a book that was based on the William James Lectures that he delivered at Harvard University in 1931. The book stands out as a diversion into uncommon philosophical territory for Dewey, adumbrated only by a somewhat sketchy and tangential treatment of art in one chapter of Experience and Nature. The unique status of the work in Dewey's corpus evoked some criticism from Dewey's followers, most notably Stephen Pepper, who believed that it marked an unfortunate departure from the naturalistic standpoint of his instrumentalism, and a return to the idealistic viewpoints of his youth. On close reading, however, Art as Experience reveals a considerable continuity of Dewey's views on art with the main themes of his previous philosophical work, while offering an important and useful extension of those themes. Dewey had always stressed the importance of recognizing the significance and integrity of all aspects of human experience. His repeated complaint against the partiality and bias of the philosophical tradition expresses this theme. Consistent with this theme, Dewey took account of qualitative immediacy in Experience and Nature, and incorporated it into his view of the developmental nature of experience, for it is in the enjoyment of the immediacy of an integration and harmonization of meanings, in the "consummatory phase" of experience that, in Dewey's view, the fruition of the re-adaptation of the individual with environment is realized. These central themes are enriched and deepened in Art as Experience, making it one of Dewey's most significant works.

The roots of aesthetic experience lie, Dewey argues, in commonplace experience, in the consummatory experiences that are ubiquitous in the course of human life. There is no legitimacy to the conceit cherished by some art enthusiasts that aesthetic enjoyment is the privileged endowment of the few. Whenever there is a coalesence into an immediately enjoyed qualitative unity of meanings and values drawn from previous experience and present circumstances, life then takes on an aesthetic quality--what Dewey called having "an experience." Nor is the creative work of the artist, in its broad parameters, unique. The process of intelligent use of materials and the imaginative development of possible solutions to problems issuing in a reconstruction of experience that affords immediate satisfaction, the process found in the creative work of artists, is also to be found in all intelligent and creative human activity. What distinguishes artistic creation is the relative stress laid upon the immediate enjoyment of unified qualitative complexity as the rationalizing aim of the activity itself, and the ability of the artist to achieve this aim by marshalling and refining the massive resources of human life, meanings, and values.

The senses play a key role in artistic creation and aesthetic appreciation. Dewey, however, argues against the view, stemming historically from the sensationalistic empiricism of David Hume, that interprets the content of sense experience simply in terms of the traditionally codified list of sense qualities, such as color, odor, texture, etc., divorced from the funded meanings of past experience. It is not only the sensible qualities present in the physical media the artist uses, but the wealth of meaning that attaches to these qualities, that constitute the material that is refined and unified in the process of artistic expression. The artist concentrates, clarifies, and vivifies these meanings in the artwork. The unifying element in this process is emotion--not the emotion of raw passion and outburst, but emotion that is reflected upon and used as a guide to the overall character of the artwork. Although Dewey insisted that emotion is not the significant content of the work of art, he clearly understands it to be the crucial tool of the artist's creative activity.

Dewey repeatedly returns in Art as Experience to a familiar theme of his critical reflections upon the history of ideas, namely that a distinction too strongly drawn too often sacrifices accuracy of account for a misguided simplicity. Two applications of this theme are worth mentioning here. Dewey rejects the sharp distinction often made in aesthetics between the matter and the form of an artwork. What Dewey objected to was the implicit suggestion that matter and form stand side by side, as it were, in the artwork as distinct and precisely distinguishable elements. For Dewey, form is better understood in a dynamic sense as the coordination and adjustment of the qualities and associated meanings that are integrated within the artwork.

A second misguided distinction that Dewey rejects is that between the artist as the active creator and the audience as the passive recipient of art. This distinction artificially truncates the artistic process by in effect suggesting that the process ends with the final artifact of the artist's creativity. Dewey argues that, to the contrary, the process is barren without the agency of the appreciator, whose active assimilation of the artist's work requires a recapitulation of many of the same processes of discrimination, comparison, and integration that are present in the artist's initial work, but now guided by the artist's perception and skill. Dewey underscores the point by distinguishing between the "art product," the painting, sculpture, etc., created by the artist, and the "work of art" proper, which is only realized through the active engagement of an astute audience.

Ever concerned with the interrelationships between the various domains of human activity and concern, Dewey ends Art as Experience with a chapter devoted to the social implications of the arts. Art is a product of culture, and it is through art that the people of a given culture express the significance of their lives, as well as their hopes and ideals. Because art has its roots in the consummatory values experienced in the course of human life, its values have an affinity to commonplace values, an affinity that accords to art a critical office in relation to prevailing social conditions. Insofar as the possibility for a meaningful and satisfying life disclosed in the values embodied in art is not realized in the lives of the members of a society, the social relationships that preclude this realization are condemned. Dewey's specific target in this chapter was the conditions of workers in industrialized society, conditions which force upon the worker the performance of repetitive tasks that are devoid of personal interest and afford no satisfaction in personal accomplishment. The degree to which this critical function of art is ignored is a further indication of what Dewey regarded as the unfortunate distancing of the arts from the common pursuits and interests of ordinary life. The realization of art's social function requires the closure of this bifurcation.

6. Critical Reception and Influence

Dewey's philosophical work received varied responses from his philosophical colleagues during his lifetime. There were many philosophers who saw his work, as Dewey himself understood it, as a genuine attempt to apply the principles of an empirical naturalism to the perennial questions of philosophy, providing a beneficial clarification of issues and the concepts used to address them. Dewey's critics, however, often expressed the opinion that his views were more confusing than clarifying, and that they appeared to be more akin to idealism than the scientifically based naturalism Dewey expressly avowed. Notable in this connection are Dewey's disputes concerning the relation of the knowing subject to known objects with the realists Bertrand Russell, A. O. Lovejoy, and Evander Bradley McGilvery. Whereas these philosophers argued that the object of knowledge must be understood as existing apart from the knowing subject, setting the truth conditions for propositions, Dewey defended the view that things understood as isolated from any relationship with the human organism could not be objects of knowledge at all.

Dewey was sensitive and responsive to the criticisms brought against his views. He often attributed them to misinterpretations based on the traditional, philosophical connotations that some of his readers would attach to his terminology. This was clearly a fair assessment with respect to some of his critics. To take one example, Dewey used the term "experience," found throughout his philosophical writings, to denote the broad context of the human organism's interrelationship with its environment, not the domain of human thought alone, as some of his critics read him to mean. Dewey's concern for clarity of expression motivated efforts in his later writings to revise his terminology. Thus, for example, he later substituted "transaction" for his earlier "interaction" to denote the relationship between organism and environment, since the former better suggested a dynamic interdependence between the two, and in a new introduction to Experience and Nature, never published during his lifetime, he offered the term "culture" as an alternative to "experience." Late in his career he attempted a more sweeping revision of philosophical terminology in Knowing and the Known, written in collaboration with Arthur F. Bentley.

The influence of Dewey's work, along with that of the pragmatic school of thought itself, although considerable in the first few decades of the twentieth century, was gradually eclipsed during the middle part of the century as other philosophical methods, such as those of the analytic school in England and America and phenomenology in continental Europe, grew to ascendency. Recent trends in philosophy, however, leading to the dissolution of these rigid paradigms, have led to approaches that continue and expand on the themes of Dewey's work. W. V. O. Quine's project of naturalizing epistemology works upon naturalistic presumptions anticipated in Dewey's own naturalistic theory of inquiry. The social dimension and function of belief systems, explored by Dewey and other pragmatists, has received renewed attention by such writers as Richard Rorty and Jürgen Habermas. American phenomenologists such as Sandra Rosenthal and James Edie have considered the affinities of phenomenology and pragmatism, and Hilary Putnam, an analytically trained philosophy, has recently acknowledged the affinity of his own approach to ethics to that of Dewey's. The renewed openness and pluralism of recent philosophical discussion has meant a renewed interest in Dewey's philosophy, an interest that promises to continue for some time to come.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

All of the published writings of John Dewey have been newly edited and published in The Collected Works of John Dewey, Jo Ann Boydston, ed., 37 volumes (Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1967-1991).

Dewey's complete correspondence has know been published in electronic form in The Correspondence of John Dewey, 3 vols., Larry Hickman, ed. (Charlottesville, Va: Intelex Corporation).

An authoritative collection of Dewey's writings is The Essential Dewey, 2 vols., Larry Hickman and Thomas M. Alexander, eds. (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1998).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Alexander, Thomas M. The Horizons of Feeling: John Dewey's Theory of Art, Experience, and Nature. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987.
  • Boisvert, Raymond D. Dewey's Metaphysics. New York: Fordham University Press, 1988.
  • Boisvert, Raymond D. John Dewey: Rethinking Our Time. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Bullert, Gary. The Politics of John Dewey. Buffalo, NY: Prometheus Books, 1983.
  • Campbell, James. Understanding John Dewey: Nature and Cooperative Intelligence. Chicago and La Salle: Open Court, 1995.
  • Damico, Alfonso J. Individuality and Community: The Social and Political Thought of John Dewey. Gainesville, FL: University Presses of Florida, 1978.
  • Dykhuizen, George. The Life and Mind of John Dewey. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1973.
  • Eames, S. Morris. Experience and Value: Essays on John Dewey and Pragmatic Naturalism.Elizabeth R. Eames and Richard W. Field, eds. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 2003.
  • Eldridge, Michael. Transforming Experience: John Dewey's Cultural Instrumentalism. Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1998.
  • Gouinlock, James. John Dewey's Philosophy of Value. New York: Humanities Press, 1972.
  • Hickman, Larry. John Dewey's Pragmatic Technology. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990.
  • Hickman, Larry A., ed. Reading Dewey: Interpretations for a Postmodern Generation. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1998.
  • Hook, Sidney. John Dewey: An Intellectual Portrait. New York: John Day Co., 1939; New York: Prometheus Books, 1995.
  • Jackson, Philip W. John Dewey and the Lessons of Art. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998.
  • Haskins, Casey and David I. Seiple, eds. Dewey Reconfigured: Essays on Deweyan Pragmatism.Albany: State University of New York Press, 1999.
  • Levine, Barbara. Works about John Dewey: 1886-1995. Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press, 1996.
  • Rockefeller, Steven C. John Dewey: Religious Faith and Democratic Humanism. New York: Columbia University Press, 1991.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur and Lewis Edwin Hahn, eds. The Philosophy of John Dewey, The Library of Living Philosophers, vol. 1. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1989.
  • Sleeper, Ralph. The Necessity of Pragmatism: John Dewey's Conception of Philosophy. New York: Yale University Press, 1987.
  • Thayer, H. S. The Logic of Pragmatism: An Examination of John Dewey's Logic. New York: Humanities Press, 1952.
  • Tiles, J. E. Dewey. London: Routledge, 1988.
  • Welchman, Jennifer. Dewey's Ethical Thought. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995.

Author Information

Richard Field
Email: rfield(at)nwmissouri.edu
Northwest Missouri State University
U. S. A.

Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803—1882)

emersonIn his lifetime, Ralph Waldo Emerson became the most widely known man of letters in America, establishing himself as a prolific poet, essayist, popular lecturer, and an advocate of social reforms who was nevertheless suspicious of reform and reformers. Emerson achieved some reputation with his verse, corresponded with many of the leading intellectual and artistic figures of his day, and during an off and on again career as a Unitarian minister, delivered and later published a number of controversial sermons. Emerson’s enduring reputation, however, is as a philosopher, an aphoristic writer (like Friedrich Nietzsche) and a quintessentially American thinker whose championing of the American Transcendental movement and influence on Walt Whitman, Henry David Thoreau, William James, and others would alone secure him a prominent place in American cultural history. Transcendentalism in America, of which Emerson was the leading figure, resembled British Romanticism in its precept that a fundamental continuity exists between man, nature, and God, or the divine. What is beyond nature is revealed through nature; nature is itself a symbol, or an indication of a deeper reality, in Emerson’s philosophy. Matter and spirit are not opposed but reflect a critical unity of experience. Emerson is often characterized as an idealist philosopher and indeed used the term himself of his philosophy, explaining it simply as a recognition that plan always precedes action. For Emerson, all things exist in a ceaseless flow of change, and “being” is the subject of constant metamorphosis. Later developments in his thinking shifted the emphasis from unity to the balance of opposites: power and form, identity and variety, intellect and fate. Emerson remained throughout his lifetime the champion of the individual and a believer in the primacy of the individual’s experience. In the individual can be discovered all truths, all experience. For the individual, the religious experience must be direct and unmediated by texts, traditions, or personality. Central to defining Emerson’s contribution to American thought is his emphasis on non-conformity that had so profound an effect on Thoreau. Self-reliance and independence of thought are fundamental to Emerson’s perspective in that they are the practical expressions of the central relation between the self and the infinite. To trust oneself and follow our inner promptings corresponds to the highest degree of consciousness.

Emerson concurred with the German poet and philosopher Johann Wolfgang von Goethe that originality was essentially a matter of reassembling elements drawn from other sources. Not surprisingly, some of Emerson’s key ideas are popularizations of both European as well as Eastern thought. From Goethe, Emerson also drew the notion of “bildung,” or development, calling it the central purpose of human existence. From the English Romantic poet and critic Samuel Taylor Coleridge, Emerson borrowed his conception of “Reason,” which consists of acts of perception, insight, recognition, and cognition. The concepts of “unity” and “flux” that are critical to his early thought and never fully depart from his philosophy are basic to Buddhism: indeed, Emerson said, perhaps ironically, that “the Buddhist . . . is a Transcendentalist.” From his friend the social philosopher Margaret Fuller, Emerson acquired the perspective that ideas are in fact ideas of particular persons, an observation he would expand into his more general—and more famous—contention that history is biography.

On the other hand, Emerson’s work possesses deep original strains that influenced other major philosophers of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. The German philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche read Emerson in German translations and his developing philosophy of the great man is clearly influenced and confirmed by the contact. Writing about the Greek philosopher Plato, Emerson asserted that “Every book is a quotation . . . and every man is a quotation,” a perspective that foreshadows the work of French Structuralist philosopher Roland Barthes. Emerson also anticipates the key Poststructuralist concept of différance found in the work of Jacques Derrida and Jacques Lacan—“It is the same among men and women, as among the silent trees; always a referred existence, an absence, never a presence and satisfaction.” While not progressive on the subject of race by modern standards, Emerson observed that the differences among a particular race are greater than the differences between the races, a view compatible with the social constructivist theory of race found in the work of contemporary philosophers like Kwame Appiah.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Major Works
  3. Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Ralph Waldo Emerson was born on May 25, 1803, in Boston to Ruth Haskins Emerson and William Emerson, pastor of Boston's First Church. The cultural milieu of Boston at the turn of the nineteenth century would increasingly be marked by the conflict between its older conservative values and the radical reform movements and social idealists that emerged in the decades leading up through the 1840s. Emerson was one of five surviving sons who formed a supportive brotherhood, the financial and emotional leadership of which he was increasingly forced to assume over the years. "Waldo," as Emerson was called, entered Harvard at age fourteen, taught in the summer, waited tables, and with his brother Edward, wrote papers for other students to pay his expenses. Graduating in the middle of his class, Emerson taught in his brother William's school until 1825 when he entered the Divinity School at Harvard. The pattern of Emerson's intellectual life was shaped in these early years by the range and depth of his extracurricular reading in history, literature, philosophy, and religion, the extent of which took a severe toll on his eyesight and health. Equally important to his intellectual development was the influence of his paternal aunt Mary Moody Emerson. Though she wrote primarily on religious subjects, Mary Moody Emerson set an example for Emerson and his brothers with her wide reading in every branch of knowledge and her stubborn insistence that they form opinions on all of the issues of the day. Mary Moody Emerson was at the same time passionately orthodox in religion and a lover of controversy, an original thinker tending to a mysticism that was a precursor to her nephew's more radical beliefs. His aunt's influence waned as he developed away from her strict orthodoxy, but her relentless intellectual energy and combative individualism left a permanent stamp on Emerson as a thinker.

In 1829, he accepted a call to serve as junior pastor at Boston's Second Church, serving only until 1832 when he resigned at least in part over his objections to the validity of the Lord's Supper. Emerson would in 1835 refuse a call as minister to East Lexington Church but did preach there regularly until 1839. In 1830, Emerson married Ellen Tucker who died the following year of tuberculosis. Emerson married again in 1835 to Lydia Jackson. Together they had four children, the eldest of whom, Waldo, died at the age of five, an event that left deep scars on the couple and altered Emerson's outlook on the redemptive value of suffering. Emerson’s first book Nature was published anonymously in 1836 and at Emerson's own expense. In 1837 Emerson delivered his famous "American Scholar" lecture as the Phi Beta Kappa address at Harvard, but his controversial Harvard Divinity School address, delivered in 1838, was the occasion of a twenty-nine year breach with the university and signaled his divergence from even the liberal theological currents of Cambridge. Compelled by financial necessity to undertake a career on the lecture circuit, Emerson began lecturing in earnest in 1839 and kept a demanding public schedule until 1872. While providing Emerson's growing family and array of dependents with a steady income, the lecture tours heightened public awareness of Emerson's ideas and work. From 1840-1844, Emerson edited The Dial with Margaret Fuller. Essays: First Series was published in 1841, followed by Essays: Second Series in 1844, the two volumes most responsible for Emerson's reputation as a philosopher. In 1844, Emerson also purchased the land on the shore of Walden Pond where he was to allow the naturalist and philosopher Henry David Thoreau to build a cabin the following year. While sympathetic to the experimental collective at Brook Farm, Emerson declined urgent appeals to join the group and maintained his own household in Concord with Lydia and their growing family. Emerson attempted to create his own community of kindred spirits, however, assembling in the neighborhood of Concord a group of writers including Thoreau, Nathaniel Hawthorne, the social thinker Margaret Fuller, the reformer Bronson Alcott, and the poet Ellery Channing. English Traits was inspired by a trip to Britain during 1847-1848. By the 1850s, Emerson was an outspoken advocate of abolition in lectures across New England and the Midwest and continued lecturing widely on a number of different topics—eighty lectures in 1867 alone. Emerson spent the final years of his life peacefully but without full use of his faculties. He died of pneumonia in 1882 at his home in Concord.

2. Major Works

As a philosopher, Emerson primarily makes use of two forms, the essay and the public address or lecture. His career began, however, with a short book, Nature, published anonymously in 1836. Nature touches on many of the ideas to which he would return to again and again over his lifetime, most significantly the perspective that nature serves as an intermediary between human experience and what lies beyond nature. Emerson expresses a similar idea in his claim that spirit puts forth nature through us, exemplary of which is the famous "transparent eye-ball" passage, in which he writes that on a particular evening, while “crossing a bare common . . . the currents of Universal Being circulate through me." On the strength this passage alone, Nature has been widely viewed as a defining text of Transcendentalism, praised and satirized for the same qualities. Emerson invokes the "transparent eye-ball" to describe the loss of individuation in the experience of nature, where there is no seer, only seeing: "I am nothing; I see all." This immersion in nature compensates us in our most difficult adversity and provides a sanctification of experience profoundly religious —the direct religious experience that Emerson was to call for all his life. While Emerson characterizes traversing the common with mystical language, it is also importantly a matter of knowledge. The fundamental knowledge of nature that circulates through him is the basis of all human knowledge but cannot be distinguished, in Emerson's thought, from divine understanding.

The unity of nature is the unity of variety, and "each particle is a microcosm." There is, Emerson writes “a universal soul” that, influenced by Coleridge, he named "reason." Nature is by turns exhortative and pessimistic, like the work of the English Romantics, portraying man as a creature fallen away from a primordial connection with nature. Man ought to live in a original relation to the universe, an assault on convention he repeats in various formulas throughout his life; however, "man is the dwarf of himself . . . is disunited with himself . . . is a god in ruins." Nature concludes with a version of Emerson's permanent program, the admonition to conform your life to the "pure idea in your mind," a prescription for living he never abandons.

"The American Scholar" and “The Divinity School Address” are generally held to be representative statements of Emerson's early period. "The American Scholar," delivered as the Phi Beta Kappa oration at Harvard in 1837, repeats a call for a distinctively American scholarly life and a break with European influences and models—a not original appeal in the 1830s. Emerson begins with a familiar critique of American and particularly New England culture by asserting that Americans were "a people too busy to give to letters any more." What must have surprised the audience was his anti-scholarly theme, that "Books are for the scholar's idle times," an idea that aligns the prodigiously learned and widely read Emerson with the critique of excessive bookishness found in Wordsworth and English Romanticism. Continuing in this theme, Emerson argues against book knowledge entirely and in favor of lived experience: "Only so much do I know, as I have lived." Nature is the most important influence on the mind, he told his listeners, and it is the same mind, one mind, that writes and reads. Emerson calls for both creative writing and "creative reading," individual development being essential for the encounter with mind found in books. The object of scholarly culture is not the bookworm but "Man Thinking," Emerson's figure for an active, self-reliant intellectual life that thus puts mind in touch with Mind and the "Divine Soul." Through this approach to the study of letters, Emerson predicts that in America "A nation of men will for the first time exist."

"The Divinity School Address," also delivered at Harvard in 1838, was considerably more controversial and marked in earnest the beginning of Emerson's opposition to the climate of organized religion in his day, even the relatively liberal theology of Cambridge and the Unitarian Church. Emerson set out defiantly to insist on the divinity of all men rather than one single historical personage, a position at odds with Christian orthodoxy but one central to his entire system of thought. The original relation to nature Emerson insisted upon ensures an original relation to the divine, not copied from the religious experience of others, even Jesus of Nazareth. Emerson observes that in the universe there is a "justice" operative in the form of compensation: “He who does a good deed is instantly ennobled." This theme he would develop powerfully into a full essay, "Compensation” (1841). Whether Emerson characterized it as compensation, retribution, balance, or unity, the principle of an automatic response to all human action, good or ill, was a permanent fixture of his thought. "Good is positive," he argued to the vexation of many in the audience, “evil merely privative, not absolute." Emerson concludes his address with a subversive call to rely on one's self, to "go alone; to refuse the good models.”

Two of Emerson's first non-occasional public lectures from this early period contain especially important expressions of his thought. Always suspicious of reform and reformers, Emerson was yet an advocate of reform causes. In "Man the Reformer" (1841), Emerson expresses this ambivalence by speculating that if we were to "Let our affection flow out to our fellows; it would operate in a day the greatest of all revolutions." In an early and partial formulation of his theory that all people, times, and places are essentially alike, he writes in "Lecture on the Times" (1841) that “The Times . . . have their root in an invisible spiritual reality;" then more fully in "The Transcendentalist” (1842): “new views . . . are not new, but the very oldest of thoughts cast into the mould of these new times." Such ideas, while quintessential Emerson, are nevertheless positions that he would qualify and complicate over the next twenty years.

Emerson brought out his Essays: First Series, in 1841, which contain perhaps his single most influential work, "Self-Reliance." Emerson's style as an essayist, not unlike the form of his public lectures, operates best at the level of the individual sentence. His essays are bound together neither by their stated theme nor the progression of argument, but instead by the systematic coherence of his thought alone. Indeed, the various titles of Emerson's do not limit the subject matter of the essays but repeatedly bear out the abiding concerns of his philosophy. Another feature of his rhetorical style involves exploring the contrary poles of a particular idea, similar to a poetic antithesis. As a philosopher-poet, Emerson employs a highly figurative style, while his poetry is remarkable as a poetry of ideas. The language of the essays is sufficiently poetical that Thoreau felt compelled to say critically of the essays—"they were not written exactly at the right crisis [to be poetry] though inconceivably near it." In “History” Emerson attempts to demonstrate the unity of experience of men of all ages: "What Plato has thought, he may think; what a saint has felt, he may feel; what at any time has befallen any man, he may understand." Interestingly, for an idealist philosopher, he describes man as "a bundle of relations." The experience of the individual self is of such importance in Emerson's conception of history that it comes to stand for history: "there is properly no history; only biography." Working back from this thought, Emerson connects his understanding of this essential unity to his fundamental premise about the relation of man and nature: "the mind is one, and that nature is correlative." By correlative, Emerson means that mind and nature are themselves representative, symbolic, and consequently correlate to spiritual facts. In the wide-ranging style of his essays, he returns to the subject of nature, suggesting that nature is itself a repetition of a very few laws, and thus implying that history repeats itself consistently with a few recognizable situations. Like the Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard, Emerson disavowed nineteenth century notions of progress, arguing in the next essay of the book, "Society never advances . . . For everything that is given, something is taken."

"Self-Reliance" is justly famous as a statement of Emerson's credo, found in the title and perhaps uniquely among his essays, consistently and without serious digression throughout the work. The emphasis on the unity of experience is the same: "what is true for you in your private heart is true for all men." Emerson rests his abiding faith in the individual—"Trust thyself”—on the fundamental link between each man and the divine reality, or nature, that works through him. Emerson wove this explicit theme of self-trust throughout his work, writing in "Heroism" (1841), “Self-trust is the essence of heroism.” The apostle of self-reliance perceived that the impulses that move us may not be benign, that advocacy of self-trust carried certain social risks. No less a friend of Emerson's than Herman Melville parodied excessive faith in the individual through the portrait of Captain Ahab in his classic American novel, Moby-Dick. Nevertheless, Emerson argued that if our promptings are bad they come from our inmost being. If we are made thus we have little choice in any case but to be what we are. Translating this precept into the social realm, Emerson famously declares, "Whoso would be a man must be a nonconformist"—a point of view developed at length in both the life and work of Thoreau. Equally memorable and influential on Walt Whitman is Emerson's idea that "a foolish consistency is the hobgoblin of small minds, adored by little statesmen and philosophers and divines." In Leaves of Grass, Whitman made of his contradictions a virtue by claiming for himself a vastness of character that encompassed the vastness of the American experience. Emerson opposes on principle the reliance on social structures (civil, religious) precisely because through them the individual approaches the divine second hand, mediated by the once original experience of a genius from another age: "An institution," as he explains, “is the lengthened shadow of one man." To achieve this original relation one must "Insist on one's self; never imitate” for if the relationship is secondary the connection is lost. "Nothing," Emerson concludes, “can bring you peace but the triumph of principles,” a statement that both in tone and content illustrates the vocational drive of the former minister to speak directly to a wide audience and preach a practical philosophy of living.

Three years later in 1844 Emerson published his Essays: Second Series, eight essays and one public lecture, the titles indicating the range of his interests: "The Poet," “Experience,” “Character,” “Manners,” “Gifts,” “Nature,” “Politics,” “Nominalist and Realist," and "New England Reformers.” “The Poet” contains the most comprehensive statement on Emerson's aesthetics and art. This philosophy of art has its premise in the Transcendental notion that the power of nature operates through all being, that it is being: "For we are not pans and barrows . . . but children of the fire, made of it, and only the same divinity transmuted." Art and the products of art of every kind—poetry, sculpture, painting, and architecture—flow from the same unity at the root of all human experience. Emerson's aesthetics stress not the object of art but the force that creates the art object, or as he characterizes this process in relation to poetry: "it is not metres, but a metre-making argument that makes a poem." “The Poet” repeats anew the Emersonian dictum that nature is itself a symbol, and thus nature admits of being used symbolically in art. While Emerson does not accept in principle social progress as such, his philosophy emphasizes the progress of spirit, particularly when understood as development. This process he allies with the process of art: "Nature has a higher end . . . ascension, or the passage of the soul into higher forms." The realm of art, ultimately for Emerson, is only an intermediary function, not an end itself: "Art is the path of the creator to his work." On this and every subject, Emerson reveals the humanism at the core of his philosophy, his human centric perspective that posits the creative principle above the created thing. "There is a higher work for Art than the arts," he argues in the essay "Art," and that work is the full creative expression of human being. Nature too has this “humanism,” to speak figuratively, in its creative process, as he writes in "The Method of Nature:" “The universe does not attract us until housed in an individual.” Most notable in "The Poet" is Emerson's call for an expressly American poetry and poet to do justice to the fact that “America is a poem in our eyes." What is required is a "genius . . . with tyrannous eye, which knew the value of our incomparable materials” and can make use of the "barbarism and materialism of the times." Emerson would not meet Whitman for another decade, only after Whitman had sent him anonymously a copy of the first edition of Leaves of Grass, in which—indicative of Emerson's influence—Whitman self-consciously assumes the role of the required poet of America and asserts, like his unacknowledged mentor, that America herself is indeed a poem.

"Experience" remains one of Emerson's best-known and often-anthologized essays. It is also an essay written out of the devastating grief that struck the Emerson household after the death of their five-year-old son, Waldo. He wrote, whether out of conviction or helplessness, "I grieve that grief can teach me nothing." Emerson goes on, rocking back and forth between resignation and affirmation, establishing along the way a number of key points. In "Experience" he defines “spirit” as “matter reduced to an extreme thinness." In keeping with the gradual shift in his philosophy from an emphasis on the explanatory model of "unity” to images suggesting balance, he describes "human life" as consisting of “two elements, power and form, and the proportion must be invariably kept." Among his more quotable aphorisms is "The years teach us much which the days never know,” a memorable argument for the idea that experience cannot be reduced to the smallest observable events, then added back up again to constitute a life; that there is, on the contrary, an irreducible whole present in a life and at work through us. "Experience" concludes with Emerson's hallmark optimism, a faith in human events grounded in his sense of the total penetration of the divine in all matter. "Every day," he writes, and "every act betrays the ill-concealed deity," a determined expression of his lifelong principle that the divine radiates through all being.

The early 1850s saw the publication of a number of distinctively American texts: Nathaniel Hawthorne's The Scarlet Letter (1850); Melville's Moby-Dick (1851); Harriet Beecher Stowe’s Uncle Tom’s Cabin (1852); and Whitman’s Leaves of Grass (1855). Emerson's Representative Men (1850) failed to anticipate this flowering of a uniquely American literature in at least one respect: none of his representative characters were American—nevertheless, each biography yields an insight into some aspect of Emerson's thought he finds in the man or in his work, so that Representative Men reads as the history of Emerson’s precursors in other times and places. Emerson structures the book around portraits of Plato, the Swedish mystic Emmanuel Swedenborg, the French essayist Montaigne, the poet William Shakespeare, the statesman Napoleon Bonaparte, and the writer Johann Wolfgang von Goethe. Each man stands in for a type, for example, Montaigne represents the "skeptic," Napoleon the “man of the world.” Humanity, for Emerson, consisted of recognizable but overlapping personality types, types discoverable in every age and nation, but all sharing in a common humanity that has its source in divine being. Each portrait balances the particular feature of the representative man that illustrates the general laws inhabiting humanity along with an assessment of the great man's shortcomings. Like Nietzsche, Emerson did not believe that great men were ends in themselves but served particular functions, notably for Emerson their capacity to "clear our eyes of egotism, and enable us to see other people in their works." Emerson's representative men are "great,” but “exist that there may be greater men." As a gesture toward self-criticism about an entire book on great men by the champion of American individualism, Emerson concedes, "there are no common men," and his biographical sketches ultimately balance both the limitations of each man with his—to use an oxymoron—distinctive universality, or in other words, the impact he has had on Emerson's thought. While Plato receives credit for establishing the "cardinal facts . . . the one and the two.—1. Unity, or Identity; and, 2. Variety," Emerson concedes that through Plato we have had no success in "explaining existence." It was Swedenborg, according to Emerson, who discovered that the smallest particles in nature are merely replicated and repeated in larger organizations, and that the physical world is symbolic of the spiritual. But although he approves of the religion Swedenborg urged, a spirituality of each and every moment, Emerson complains the mystic lacks the "liberality of universal wisdom." Instead, we are “always in a church.” From Montaigne, Emerson gained a heightened sense of the universal mind as he read the French philosophers' Essays, for "It seemed to me as if I had myself written the book"—as well as an enduring imperative of style: "Cut these words, and they would bleed.” The “skeptic” Montaigne, however, lacks belief, which "consists in accepting the affirmations of the soul." From Shakespeare, Emerson received confirmation that originality was a reassembly of existing ideas. The English poet possessed the rare capacity of greatness in that he allowed the spirit of his age to achieve representation through him. Nevertheless the world waits on "a poet-priest" who can see, speak, and act, with equal inspiration." Reflection on Napoleon's life teaches the value of concentration, one of Emerson’s chief virtues. In The Conduct of Life, Emerson describes "concentration," or bringing to bear all of one's powers on a single object, as the "chief prudence." Likewise, Napoleon's shrewdness consisted in allowing events to take their natural course and become representative of the forces of his time. The defect of the "man of the world" was that he possessed “the powers of intellect without conscience" and was doomed to fail. Emerson's moral summary of Napoleon’s sounds a great deal like Whitman: "Only that good profits, which we can taste with all doors open, and which serves all men." Goethe, "the writer,” like Napoleon, represents the countervailing force of nature against Emerson's lifelong opponent, what he called "the morgue of convention." Goethe is also exemplary of the man of culture whose sphere of knowledge, as Emerson himself tried to emulate with his wide and systematic reading, knows no limits or categorical boundaries. Yet, "the lawgiver of art is not an artist," and repeating a call for an original relation to the infinite, foregoing even the venerable authority of Goethe, Emerson concludes, "We too must write Bibles."

English Traits was published in 1856 but represented almost a decade of reflections on an invited lecture tour Emerson made in 1847-48 to Great Britain. English Traits presents an unusually conservative set of perspectives on a rather limited subject, that of a single nation and "race," in place of human civilization and humanity as a whole. English Traits contains an advanced understanding of race, namely, that the differences among the members of a race are greater than the differences between races, but in general introduces few new ideas. The work is highly "occasional," shaped by his travels and visits, and bore evidence of what seemed to be an erosion of energy and originality in his thought.

The Conduct of Life (1860), however, proved to be a work of startling vigor and insight and is Emerson's last important work published in his lifetime. "Fate" is arguably the central essay in the book. The subject of fate, which Emerson defines as “An expense of means to end," along with the relation of fate to freedom and the primacy of man's vocation, come to be the chief subjects of the final years of his career. Some of Emerson's finest poetry can be found in his essays. In "Fate" he writes: “A man’s power is hooped in by a necessity, which, by many experiments, he touches on every side, until he learns its arc." Fate is balanced in the essay by intellect: "So far as a man thinks, he is free." Emerson's advice for the conduct of life is to learn to swim with the tide, to "trim your bark" (that is, sails) to catch the prevailing wind. He refines and redefines his conception of history as the interaction between "Nature and thought." Emerson further refines his conception of the great man by describing him as the “impressionable” man, or the man who most perfectly captures the spirit of his time in his thought and action. Varying a biblical proverb to his own thought, Emerson argues that what we seek we will find because it is our fate to seek what is our own. Always a moderating voice in politics, Emerson writes in "Power" that the “evils of popular government appear greater than they are”—at best a lukewarm recommendation of democracy. On the subject of politics, Emerson consistently posited a faith in balance, the tendencies toward chaos and order, change and conservation always correcting each other. His late aesthetics reinforce this political stance as he veers in "Beauty" onto the subject of women's suffrage: “Thus the circumstances may be easily imagined, in which woman may speak, vote, argue causes, legislate, and drive a coach, and all the most naturally in the world, if only it come by degrees."

In his early work, Emerson emphasized the operation of nature through the individual man. The Conduct of Life uncovers the same consideration only now understood in terms of work or vocation. Emerson argued with increasing regularity throughout his career that each man is made for some work, and to ally himself with that is to render himself immune from harm: "the conviction that his work is dear to God and cannot be spared, defends him." One step above simple concentration of force in Emerson's scale of values we find his sense of dedication: "Nothing is beneath you, if it is in the direction of your life." While in favor of many of the social and political reform movements of his time, Emerson never ventured far into a critique of laissez-faire economics. In "Wealth" we find the balanced perspective, one might say contradiction, to be found in all the late work. Emerson argues that to be a "whole man" one must be able to find a "blameless living," and yet this same essay acknowledges an unsentimental definition of wealth: “He is the richest man who knows how to draw a benefit from the labors of the greatest numbers of men." In the final essay of the book, "Illusions," Emerson uses a metaphor—“the sun borrows his beams”—to reassert his pervasive humanism, the idea that we endow nature with its beauty, and that man is at the center of creation. Man is at the center, and the center will hold: "There is no chance, and no anarchy, in the universe."

3. Legacy

Emerson remains the major American philosopher of the nineteenth century and in some respects the central figure of American thought since the colonial period. Perhaps due to his highly quotable style, Emerson wields a celebrity unknown to subsequent American philosophers. The general reading public knows Emerson's work primarily through his aphorisms, which appear throughout popular culture on calendars and poster, on boxes of tea and breath mints, and of course through his individual essays. Generations of readers continue to encounter the more famous essays under the rubric of "literature" as well as philosophy, and indeed the essays, less so his poetry, stand undiminished as major works in the American literary tradition. Emerson's emphasis on self-reliance and nonconformity, his championing of an authentic American literature, his insistence on each individual's original relation to God, and finally his relentless optimism, that "life is a boundless privilege," remain his chief legacies.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Baker, Carlos. Emerson Among the Eccentrics: A Group Portrait. New York: Penguin, 1997.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo: Essays and Lectures. Ed. Joel Porte. New York: Library of America, 1983.
  • Essays and Poems. Ed. Joel Porte et al. New York: Library of American, 1996.
  • The Complete Sermons of Ralph Waldo Emerson. Vol. 4. Ed Wesley T. Mott et al. Columbia, MO: University of Missouri Press, 1992.
  • The Selected Letters of Ralph Waldo Emerson. Ed. Joel Myerson. New York: Columbia, 1997.
  • The Heart of Emerson's Journals. Ed. Bliss Perry. Minneola, NY: Dover Press, 1995.
  • Field, Peter. S. Ralph Waldo Emerson: The Making of a Democratic Intellectual. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2002.
  • Porte, Joel. Representative Man: Ralph Waldo Emerson in His Time. New York: Columbia University Press, 1988.
  • Porte, Joel and Morris, Saundra. The Cambridge Companion to Ralph Waldo Emerson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Richardson, Robert D. Jr. Emerson: The Mind on Fire. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1995

Author Information

Vince Brewton
Email: vjbrewton@una.edu
University of North Alabama
U. S. A.

Clarence Irving Lewis (1883-1964)

A major American pragmatist educated at Harvard, C. I. Lewis taught at the University of California from 1911 to 1919 and at Harvard from 1920 until his retirement in 1953. Known as the father of modern modal logic and as a proponent of the given in epistemology, he also was an influential figure in value theory and ethics.

Lewis’s philosophy as a whole reveals a systematic unity in which logic, epistemology, value theory and ethics all take their place as forms of rational conduct in its broadest sense of self-directed agency. In his first major work, Mind and the World Order (MWO), published in 1929, Lewis put forward a position he called “conceptualistic pragmatism” according to which empirical knowledge depends upon a sensuous ‘given’, the constructive activity of a mind and a set of a priori concepts which the agent brings to, and thereby interprets, the given. These concepts are the product of the agent’s social heritage and cognitive interests, so they are not a priori in the sense of being given absolutely: they are pragmatically a priori. They admit of alternatives and the choice among them rests on pragmatic considerations pertaining to cognitive success.

His 1932 Symbolic Logic presented his system of strict implication and a set of successively stronger modal logics, the S systems. He showed that there are many alternative systems of logic, each self-evident in its own way, a fact which undermines the traditional rationalistic view of metaphysical first principles as being logically undeniable. As a result, he concluded that the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical or pragmatic considerations.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Early Years
  3. Logical Investigations
  4. Mind and the World Order
  5. The Conversation with Positivism
  6. Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation
  7. Valuation and Rightness
  8. The Late Ethics
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Major Works by Lewis
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

Lewis's philosophy as a whole reveals a systematic unity in which logic, epistemology, value theory and ethics all take their place as forms of rational conduct in its broadest sense of self-directed agency. In his first major work, Mind and the World Order (MWO), published in 1929, Lewis put forward a position he called "conceptualistic pragmatism" according to which empirical knowledge depends upon a sensuous 'given', the constructive activity of a mind and a set of a priori concepts which the agent brings to, and thereby interprets, the given. These concepts are the product of the agent's social heritage and cognitive interests, so they are not a priori in the sense of being given absolutely: they are pragmatically a priori. They admit of alternatives and the choice among them rests on pragmatic considerations pertaining to cognitive success.

His 1932 Symbolic Logic presented his system of strict implication and a set of successively stronger modal logics, the S systems. He showed that there are many alternative systems of logic, each self- evident in its own way, a fact which undermines the traditional rationalistic view of metaphysical first principles as being logically undeniable. As a result, he concluded that the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical or pragmatic considerations.

After the War his work played an important part in giving shape to academic philosophy as a profession. His 1946 Carus Lectures, An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation (AKV) which represents a refinement of the doctrines of MWO and their extension to a theory of value, set the issues of postwar epistemology. The thoroughness of his discussion, and the technicalities of his writing were important models for postwar analytic philosophy. A student of Josiah Royce, William James and Ralph Barton Perry, a contemporary of Reichenbach, Carnap and the logical empiricists of the 30's and 40's, and the teacher of Quine, Frankena, Goodman, Chisholm, Firth and others, C.I. Lewis played a pivotal role in shaping the marriage between pragmatism and empiricism which has come to dominate much of current analytic philosophy.

After AKV, Lewis directed the final 20 years of his life to the foundation of ethics, giving numerous public lectures. He died in 1964 leaving a vast collection of unpublished manuscripts on ethical theory which are housed at the Stanford University Library.

2. The Early Years

Lewis was born on April 12, 1883, in relative poverty at Stoneham, Massachusetts. He enrolled in Harvard in 1902 , working part time as a tutor and a waiter, and received his B.A. degree three years later, taking an appointment to teach high school English in Quincy, Massachusetts. The following year he was appointed Instructor in English at the University of Colorado, moved to Boulder, and that winter married his high school sweetheart, Mabel Maxwell Graves. They stayed in Boulder for two years and in 1908 he enrolled in the PhD program, receiving his degree two years later in 1910, in part because financial concerns precluded a more leisurely pace. His thesis, The Place of Intuition in Knowledge prefigured important themes in his later work.

As an undergraduate, Lewis's principal influences were James and Royce. When he returned to Harvard as a graduate student, James had retired, and the absolute idealism of Royce and Bradley was under attack by the New Realism of Moore and Russell in Great Britain and of W.P. Montague and Ralph Barton Perry at Harvard. The debate between Royce and James over monism and pluralism had been replaced by a debate between Royce and Perry over realism and idealism. Lewis studied metaphysics with Royce, and he studied Kant and epistemology with Perry. The debate between Royce and Perry framed Lewis's dissertation and in it he attempted to forge a neo-Kantian middle road.

It is worth briefly discussing his dissertation because in many way it prefigures his later views. In his dissertation Lewis argued that the possibility of valid, justified, knowledge requires both givenness (or intuition) and the mind's legislative or constructive activity. Lewis used the egocentric predicament in a dialectical argument against both the realist and idealist solutions to the problem of knowledge. Against Perry's direct realism, he argued that what is known transcends what is present to the mind in the act of knowledge and that the real object is thus never given in consciousness; since knowledge requires that what is given to the mind be interpreted by our purposeful activity the real object of knowledge is made instead of given.

Against Royce, Lewis asserted the necessity of a given sensuous element that is neither a product of willing nor necessarily implicit in the cognitive aim of ideas. The mind's activity is not constitutive of the known object because it does not make the given. Its purpose is rather to understand, or interpret, the given by referring it to an object which is real in some category or another. To be real is a matter of classification and only future experience will confirm or disconfirm the correctness of our classification, but some classification of the given will necessarily be correct. Whatever is unreal is so only relative to a certain way of understanding it Relative to some other purpose of understanding it will be real; the contents of a dream, for example are unreal only relative to a misclassification of them as a veridical perception. All knowledge contains a given element which shapes possible interpretation but the object known also transcends present experience.

It is remarkable how many themes in his mature work are already mobilized in his dissertation. Lewis's solution to the problem of knowledge had both realist and idealist elements in an unstable equilibrium and his position would change several times over the next few years. Under the influence of Royce and Hume's skepticism, Lewis came to believe that no realist answer to the problem of knowledge could work, and only an idealist solution would suffice. "How could the given be intelligible to the mind if it were independent of its interpretive activity?" This is a question which Lewis would not solve to his satisfaction until much later when he read Peirce. There is no doubt, however, that Lewis saw that a realist of Perry's sort had no answer to it. At this point Lewis clearly had neither proof nor account of the relation of knowledge to independent reality. The synthesis of his dissertation had raised deep problems which were only to be answered by the mature system in MWO . "How can the given be intelligible if it is independent of the mind?" "If the mind does not shape or condition what is given to it how could valid knowledge be possible?" It seemed clear to Lewis that if justified knowledge were possible at all, then realism must be wrong. But idealism, as Lewis understood it, appealed to a necessary agreement between human will and the absolute in knowledge which was also unjustifiable.

3. Logical Investigations

Lewis received his PhD in 1910 but there were no jobs. This was a bitter disappointment for Lewis, who with a wife and small child, had hoped the financial difficulties of the past two years would be over. After a summer at his uncle's farm the Lewises returned to Cambridge where Lewis spent the year tutoring and serving as an assistant in Royce's logic class. Royce was one of America's premier logicians during the time that Lewis was studying at Harvard and he introduced Lewis to Volume 1 of Russell and Whitehead's Principia Mathematica which had just been published.

In the fall of 1911, Lewis went to the University of California at Berkeley as an instructor where, except for a stint in the army during World War I, he was to stay until his return to Harvard in 1920. During this period, Lewis worked primarily on epistemology and logic and, finding no logic texts available, was soon at work on a text on symbolic logic. This work would appear at the end of the war in 1918 as A Survey of Symbolic Logic the first history of the subject in English -- and would form the basis of his better known Symbolic Logic , written together with C. H. Langford and published in 1932. Lewis's work on logic was dictated in part by the need for a good text book and in part by objections to the paradoxes of material implication in Principia Mathematica and his desire to develop an account of inference more reflective of human reasoning. However, Lewis was still exercised by the problem of knowledge from his dissertation and was increasingly unhappy with the quasi-idealist solution he had explored there. In fact, Lewis's study of logic during this period was at least in part directed towards examining important idealist assumptions about logic, which he would come to reject.

To solve the problem of knowledge the idealist needed logical truth to be absolute, for if the categorial form of our constructive will could vary then we would have no reason to take our interpretations to be true of the world. Lewis would attack the idealist assumptions in four related ways. First, he would argue that the coherence of a system of propositions depends upon the consistency of the propositions with each other and not on their dependence upon a set of absolute or self-evident truths. Secondly, he argued that a system rich enough to capture the notion of a world, or system of facts, is necessarily pluralistic in the sense that it must contain elements which are logically independent of each other. Thirdly, he argued that the existence of alternative deductive systems completely undermines the rationalistic view that metaphysical first principles can be shown to be logically necessary through the argument of 'reaffirmation through denial' (where in the attempt to deny a logical principle we necessarily presuppose its truth). Finally, he concluded that given the existence of alternative systems of logic, the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical, pragmatic considerations.

Lewis's work in logic was also guided in part by concerns about Russell's choice of material implication as a paradigm of logical deduction. Lewis constructed his own logical calculus based on relations in intention and strict implication, which he saw as a more adequate model of actual inference. Material implication has the property that a false proposition implies everything and so argued Lewis it is useless as a model of real inference. What we want to know is what would follow from a proposition if it were true and for Lewis this amounts to saying that the real basis of the inference is the strict implication where 'A strictly implies B' means that 'The truth of A is inconsistent with the falsity of B.' Lewis saw his account of strict implication to have important consequences for metaphysics and for the normative in general. He argued that the line dividing propositions corroborated or refuted by logic alone (necessary or logically impossible propositions) from the class of empirical truths or falsehood was of first importance of the theory of knowledge. The categories of possible and impossible, contingent and necessary, consistent and inconsistent are all independent of material truth and are founded on logic itself.

In 1920 Lewis was invited to return to Harvard to take up a one year position as Lecturer in Philosophy and was to remain for over 30 years until his retirement in 1953. There Lewis was reintroduced to Peirce and the last piece of his account of knowledge would fall into place, THE PRAGMATIC a priori.

After Peirce's death Royce had arranged for the Peirce manuscripts to be brought to Harvard, and at the time of Lewis's appointment the department was concerned that the manuscript remains, consisting of thousands of pages of apparently unorganized material, be catalogued. Lewis was given the job and although the task of arranging and cataloguing the papers ultimately passed to others, the two years he spent on that task gave Lewis the final building blocks for his mature epistemological position which he would call conceptualistic pragmatism. Lewis would find in Peirce's "conceptual pragmatism," with its emphasis upon the instrumental and empirical significance of concepts rather than upon any non-absolute character of truth, a resonance with his logical investigations.

Lewis in effect would turn the idealist thesis that mind determined the structure of reality on its head without giving up the idealist view of the legislative power of the mind. The mind interprets the given by way of concepts: the real, ultimately, becomes a matter of criterial commitment. The mind does not thereby manufacture what is given to it, but meets the independent given with interpretive structures which it brings to the encounter. In his dissertation Lewis had argued that the possibility of valid, justified, knowledge requires both givenness and the mind's legislative or constructive activity. The epistemological view Lewis would now develop retained this basic structure but embedded it in a richer, psycho-biological model of inquiry and a more adequate account of the role of a priori concepts in knowledge. In the early 20's Lewis would publish two seminal articles, "A Pragmatic Conception of The a priori," and "The Pragmatic Element in Knowledge." These two papers laid out the core of Lewis's pragmatic theory of knowledge, which would be developed more richly in Mind and the World Order (MWO).

In "A Pragmatic Conception of the a priori," Lewis rejected traditional concepts of the a priori arguing that, "The thought which both rationalism and empiricism have missed is that there are principles, representing the initiative of mind, which impose upon experience no limitations whatever, but that such conceptions are still subject to alternation on pragmatic grounds when the expanding boundaries of experience reveal their felicity as intellectual instruments." What is important about an hypothesis is that it is a "concept" -- a purely logical meaning -- which can be brought to bear on experience. The concepts we formulate are in part determined by our pragmatic interests and in part by the nature of experience. Fundamental scientific laws are a priori because they order experience so that it can be investigated. The same is true of our more fundamental categorial notions. The given contains both the real and illusion, dream and fantasy. Our categorial concepts allow us to sort experience so that it can be interrogated. Thus the fact that we must fix our meanings before we can apply them productively in experience, is entirely compatible with their historical alteration or even abandonment.

In "The Pragmatic Element in Knowledge", Lewis extended his pragmatism about the a priori to the theory of knowledge. Here, following Peirce and Royce, he identifies three elements in knowledge which are separable only by analysis: the element of experience which is given to an agent, the structure of concepts with which the agent interprets what is given, and the agent's act of interpreting what is given by means of those concepts. The distinctively pragmatic character of this theory lies both in the fact that knowledge is activity or interpretation and that the concepts with which the mind interrogates experience reflect fallible and revisable commitments to future experiential consequences. Knowledge is an interpretation of the experiential significance for an agent with certain interests of what is given in experience; a significance testable by its consequences for action.

A priori truth is independent of experience because it is purely analytic of our concepts and can dictate nothing to the given. The formal sciences depend on nothing which is empirically given, depending purely on logical analysis for their content. So a priori truth is not assertive of fact but is instead definitive. There is logical order arising from our definitions in all knowledge. Ordinarily we do not separate out this logical order, but it is always possible to do so, and it is this element which minds must have in common if they are to understand each other. As Lewis puts it, "At the end of an hour which feels very long to you and short to me, we can meet by agreement, because our common understanding of that hour is not a feeling of tedium or vivacity, but means sixty minutes, one round of the clock...". In short, shared concepts do not depend upon the identity of sense feeling, but in their objective significance for action.

The concept, the purely logical pattern of meaning, is an abstraction from the richness of actual experience. It represents what the mind brings to experience in the act of interpretation. The other element, that which the mind finds , or what is independent of thought, is the given. The given is also an abstraction, but it cannot be expressed in language because language implies concepts and because the given is that aspect of experience which concepts do not convey. Knowledge is the significance which experience has for possible action and the further experience to which such action would lead.

4. Mind and the World Order

Lewis first major book, Mind and the World Order (MWO) develops these results in three principal theses: first, a priori truth is definitive and offers criteria by means of which experience can be discriminated; second, the application of concepts to any particular experience is hypothetical and the choice of conceptual system meets pragmatic needs; and third, the susceptibility of experience to conceptual interpretation requires no particular metaphysical assumption about the conformity of experience to the mind or its categories. These principles allow Lewis to present the traditional problem of knowledge as resting on a mistake. There is no contradiction between the relativity of knowledge to the knowing mind and the independence of its object. The assumption that there is, is the product of Cartesian representationalism, the 'copy theory' of thought, in which knowledge of an object is taken to be qualitative coincidence between the idea in the mind and the external real object. For Lewis knowledge does not copy anything but concerns the relation between this experience and other possible experiences of which this experience is a sign. Knowledge is expressible not because we share the same data of sense but because we share concepts and categorial commitments.

All knowledge is conceptual; the given, having no conceptual structure of its own, is not even a possible object of knowledge. Foundationalism of the classical empiricist sort is thus directly precluded. Lewis's task for MWO is in effect a pragmatic solution to Hume's problem of induction: an account of the order we bring to experience which renders knowledge possible but makes no appeal to anything lying outside of experience. Prefiguring contemporary externalist accounts of representation, Lewis argues that both representative realism and phenomenalism are incoherent. Knowledge as correct interpretation is independent of whether the phenomenal character of experience is a "likeness" of the real object known, because the phenomenal character of experience only receives its function as a sign from its conceptual interpretation, that is, from its significance for future experience and action. The question of the validity of knowledge claims is thus for Lewis fundamentally the question of the normative significance of our empirical assessments for action.

Lewis argued that our spontaneous interpretation of experience by way of concepts that have objective significance for future experience constitutes a kind of diagnosis of appearance . If we could not recognize a sensuous content in our classification of it with qualitatively similar ones which have acquired predictive significance in the past, interpretation would be impossible. Despite the fact that such recognition is spontaneous and unconsidered it has the logical character of a generalization. To recognize an object -- "this is a round penny" -- is to make a fallible empirical claim, but to recognize the appearance is to classify it with other qualitatively similar appearances. The basis of the empirical judgment lies in the fact that past instances of such classification have been successful. Our empirical knowledge claims are dependent for their justification upon this body of conceptual interpretations in two ways. First, the world, in the form of future events implicitly predicted (or not) by our empirical judgments, will confirm or disconfirm those judgments: all empirical knowledge is thus merely probable. But secondly, the classification of immediate apprehensions by way of concepts justifying particular empirical judgments is itself generalization even when those concepts have come to function as a criterion of sense meaning. Concepts become criteria of classification because they allow us to make empirically valid judgments, and because they fit usefully in the larger structure of our concepts.

This structure, looked at apart from experience is an a priori system of concepts. The application of one of its constituent concepts to any particular is a matter of probability but the question of applying the system in general is a matter of the choice of an abstract system and can only be determined by pragmatic considerations. The implications of a concept within a system become criteria of its applicability in that system. If later experience does not accord with the logical implications of our application of a concept to a particular, we will withdraw the application of the concept. Persistent failure of individual concepts to apply fruitfully to experience will lead us to readjust the system as a whole. Our conceptual interpretations form a hierarchy in which some are more fundamental than others; abandoning them will have more radical consequences than abandoning others. Lewis's account of inquiry offers both a non-metaphysical account of induction and an early version of the so called 'theory-ladenness of observation terms'. There is no need for synthetic a priori or metaphysical truths to bridge the gap between abstract concepts in the mind and the reality presented in experience. Lewis offers a kind of 'Kantian deduction of the categories' providing a pragmatic vindication of induction but without Kant's assumption that experience is limited by the modes of intuition and fixed forms of thought. Without a system of conceptual interpretation, no experience is possible, but which system of interpretation we use is a matter of choice and what we experience is given to us by reality. The importance of the given in this story is its independence . Our conceptual system can at best specify a system of possible worlds; within it the actual is not to be deduced but acknowledged. In short, Lewis's theory of knowledge in MWO is a pragmatic theory of inquiry which combines rationalist and naturalistic elements to make knowledge of the real both fallible and progressive without recourse to transcendental guarantees.

5. The Conversation with Positivism

MWO was published in 1929 during a time of tragedy for Lewis and his family. MWO was very well received and Lewis's career was now secure; he was elected to the American Academy of Arts and Sciences in May of 1929 and made a full professor at Harvard in 1930. But his daughter died that year after two years of a mysterious ailment and a few years later Lewis suffered a heart attack due to overwork. Despite life's trials, the period between MWO and AKV was a period of intellectual expansion for Lewis. Lewis began to explore the consequences of his views for value theory and ethics. At the same time his logical interests shifted. While technical issues continued to occupy his attention for the next few years, largely in the form of replies to responses to his work in Symbolic Logic , his thinking shifted decisively away from technicalities and towards the experiential structure of meaning and its relation to value and knowledge. There were several reasons for this.

The period was a time of decisive change in philosophy in America generally. The influx of British and German philosophy into the United States during the thirties and the increasing professionalization of the universities, posed deep and ambiguous problems for American philosophers with a naturalistic or pragmatic orientation, and for Lewis in particular. Logical empiricism, with its emphasis on scientific models of knowledge and on the logical analysis of meaning claims was emerging as the most pervasive tendency in American philosophy in the thirties and forties, and Lewis was strongly identified with that movement. But Lewis was never completely comfortable in this company. For Lewis, experience was always at the center of the cognitive enterprise. The rapid abandonment of experiential analysis in favor of physicalism by the major positivists and their rejection of value as lacking cognitive significance both struck him as particularly unfortunate. Indeed his own deepening conversation with the pragmatic tradition led him in the opposite direction. It is only within experience that anything could have significance for anything, and Lewis came to see that rather than lacking cognitive significance, value is one way of representing the significance which knowledge has for future conduct. Attempting to work out these convictions led him to reflect on the differences between pragmatism and positivism, and to begin to investigate the cognitive structure of value experiences.

The pragmatist, Lewis holds, is committed to the Peircean pragmatic test of significance. But, as he notes in his 1930 essay, "Pragmatism and Current Thought," this dictum can be taken in either of two directions. On the one hand, its emphasis on experience could be developed in a psychologistic direction and promote a form of subjectivism. On the other, the fact that the Peircean test limits meaning to that which makes a verifiable difference in experience takes it in the direction which he developed in MWO, to a view of concepts as abstractions in which "the immediate is precisely that element which must be left out." But this claim must be correctly understood. An operational account of concepts empties them only of what is ineffable in experience. "If your hours are felt as twice as long as mine, your pounds twice as heavy, that makes no difference, which can be tested, in our assignment of physical properties to things." A concept is thus merely a relational pattern. But it does not follow from this that the world as it is experienced is thrown out the window. "In one sense that of connotation a concept strictly comprises nothing but an abstract configuration of relations. In another sense its denotation or empirical application this meaning is vested in a process which characteristically begins with something given and ends with something done in the operation which translates a presented datum into an instrument of prediction and control." Knowledge is a matter of two moments, beginning and ending in experience although it does not end in the same experience in which it begins. Knowledge of something requires that the experience which is anticipated or envisaged as verifying it is actually met with. Thus, the appeal to an operational definition or test of verifiability as the empirical meaning of a statement is, for the pragmatist, the requirement that the speaker know how to apply or refuse to apply the statement in question and to trace its consequences in the case of presented or imagined situations.

In his 1933 presidential address to the American Philosophical Association, "Experience and Meaning", Lewis dealt with the question of verifiable significance in a very general way emphasizing both the points of agreement and difference between pragmatism and logical positivism. Lewis framed the discussion of meaning in terms of the distinction between immediacy and transcendence, sketching arguments against both phenomenalism and representational realism. What remains, the third way, is a view of meaning common to absolute idealism, logical positivism and pragmatism. Meaning is a relation of verifiability or signification between present and possible future experience.

In "Logical Positivism and Pragmatism", Lewis compared his pragmatic conception of empirical meaning with the verificationism of logical positivism in a sharply critical way. Both movements, he argued, are forms of empiricism and hold conceptions of empirical meaning as verifiable ultimately by reference to empirical eventualities. The pragmatic conception of meaning looks superficially very much like the logical- positivist theory of verification despite its different formulation and its focus on action. But, argues Lewis, there is a deep difference. Whereas the pragmatic account rests meaning ultimately upon conceivable experience, the positivist account logicizes the relation. Lewis's complaint is that this results in a conception of meaning which omits precisely what a pragmatist would count as the empirical meaning. Specifying which observation sentences are consequences of a given sentence helps us know the empirical meaning of a sentences only if the observation sentences themselves have an already understood empirical meaning in terms of the specific qualities of experience to which the observations predicates of the statement apply. Thus for Lewis the logical positivist fails to distinguish between linguistic meaning, which concerns logical relations with other terms, and empirical meaning, which concerns the relation expressions have to what may be given in experience, and as a result, leaves out precisely the thing which actually confirms a statement, namely the content of experience.

The emphasis on the experience of the knower points to a yet larger contrast between positivism and pragmatism regarding the difference between judgments of value and judgments of fact. Lewis was entirely opposed to the positivist conception of value statements as devoid of cognitive content, as merely expressive. For the pragmatist all judgments are, implicitly, judgments of value. Lewis would develop both the conception of sense meaning and the thesis that valuation is a form of empirical cognition in AKV .

6. Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation

In 1946 The Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation (AKV) was published, and Lewis was awarded the Edgar Pierce Professorship at Harvard, the chair which had been held by Perry and would be held by Quine after Lewis. AKV was the most widely discussed book of its day.

The pragmatic psycho-biological model of inquiry which Lewis adopted from Peirce and James is even more visibly a part of AKV than it was in MWO. Knowledge, action and evaluation are essentially connected animal adaptive responses. Cognition, as a vital function, is a response to the significance which items in an organism's experiential environment have for that organism. Any psychological attitude which carries cognitive significance as a response will exhibit some value character of utility or disutility which can ground the correctness or incorrectness of that response as knowledge. Cognitively guided behavior is a kind of adaptive response, and the correctness of behavior guiding experience, to the extent that it carries cognitive significance, depends simply on whether the expectations lodged in it come about as the result of action. Meaning, in this sense is anticipation of further experience associated with present content and the truth of it concerns the verifiability of expected consequences of action. It is because of this that sense-apprehension is basic and underlies other forms of empirical cognition. Perceptual cognition involves a sign-function connecting present experience and possible future eventualities grounded in some mode of action which, pervading the experience in its immediacy, gives it its cognitive content.

The signifying character of the expectancies lodged in immediate experience is enormously expanded by the web of concepts we inherit as language users. Lewis did not, however, identify meaning with linguistic signs. Linguistic signs are secondary to something more basic in our experience which we share with animals generally and which occurs when something within our experience stands for something else as a sign. When the cat comes running because she hears you opening a can and takes it as a sign of dinner, she is responding to the meaning of her experience. While this meaning is independent of whether or not you are opening a can of cat food her expectation will be confirmed if the can contains cat food and disconfirmed if it doesn't.

Meaning in this sense of empirical significance could only be available to a creature who can act in anticipation of events to be realized or avoided. Accordingly, the possible is epistemologically prior to the actual. Only an agent, for whom experience could have anticipatory significance, could have a concept of objective reality as that which is possible to verify or change. In addition to meaning as empirical significance Lewis distinguished the kind of meaning involved in the apprehension of our concepts. A definition represents a mode of classification, and although alternative modes of classification can be more or less useful, classification cannot be determined by that which is to be classified. Knowledge of meanings in this sense is analytic.

In AKV, Lewis distinguishes between four modes of meaning: (1) the denotation or extension of a term is the class of actual things to which the terms applies; (2) the comprehension of a term is the class of all possible things to which the term would correctly apply; (3) the signification of a term is the character of things the presence or absence of which determines the comprehension of the term; (4) the intension of a term is the conjunction of all the other terms which must be correctly applicable to anything to which the term correctly applies. A proposition is a term capable of signifying a state of affairs; it comprehends any possible world which would contain the state of affairs it signifies. The intension of a proposition includes whatever the proposition entails and thus comprises whatever must be true of any possible world for that proposition to be true of it.

Intentional and denotational modes of meaning are two aspects of cognitive apprehension in general, the denotational being that aspect of apprehension which, given our classifications, is dependent upon how experience turns out, and the intentional being that aspect of apprehension which reflects the classifications or definitions we have made and is thus independent of experience. Our choice of classification is essentially pragmatic, however, so what may count as an empirical matter in one context may count legislatively in another, generalizations may be corrected by future experience and our definitions replaced on the grounds of inadequacy. The analytic element in knowledge is indispensable because unless our intensions are fixed our terms have no denotation, but nothing determines how we shall fix our intensions save the superior utility of one set of terms over others.

While intensional meaning is primary for him, Lewis distinguishes between two different ways in which we can think of it. First, linguistic meaning is intension as constituted by the pattern of definitions of our terms. Secondly, sense meaning is intension as the criterion in terms of sense by which the application of terms to experience is determined. Sense meaning is more fundamental. Learning involves the extension of generalizations to unobserved cases and correlatively recognizing in new experiences the correct applicability of our terms. The sense meaning of a term is our criterion for applying the term correctly. In a thought experiment anticipating Searle's "Chinese Room," Lewis imagines a person who somehow learns Arabic using only an Arabic dictionary thus learning all the linguistic patterns in the language. This person would grasp the linguistic meanings of all the terms in Arabic but might nonetheless not know the meaning of any of the terms in the sense of knowing their application to the world. The language would remain a meaningless and arbitrary system of syntactic relationships. Linguistic meaning is nonetheless central in communication because what can be shared is conceptual structure. Understanding between two minds depends not on postulated identity of imagery or sensation but on shared definitions and concepts.

The validation of empirical knowledge has two dimensions, its verification and its justification. Verification is predictive and formulates our expectations for verification or falsification. Justification looks to the rational credibility of those expectations prior to their verification. In the acquisition of knowledge these dimensions support each other. The warrant which our present beliefs have is shaped by the history of past verifications of similar beliefs. Reflection on the warranted expectancies in our present beliefs leads us to formulate new generalizations and normative principles we can subject to tests. The common stock of concepts in our language embeds such principles and empirical generalizations in the intensions of terms. As a result our use of terms decisively shapes what is warranted and verifiable for us.

Lewis distinguishes between three classes of empirical statements. First, there are what he calls expressive statements which attempt to express what is presently given in experience. An ordinary perceptual judgment, say seeing my cat by the fridge, outstrips what is presently evident. This added content is carried by the intensions of the concepts in the judgment insofar as they convey the expectancies found in the experience. These expectancies, although partly a function of past learning and knowledge of the intension of terms, are simply given in the experience, they are the part we do not invent and cannot change but merely find. Lewis suggests that we can use language expressively to capture this presentational content by stripping our meaning of its ordinary implication of objective content. Secondly, there are statements which formulate predictions. The judgment that if I do action A the outcome will include E, where E indicates an aspect of experience expressively characterized, is one which can be completely verified by putting it to the test. Upon acting the content E will either be given or it will not. Lewis calls empirical judgments of this sort terminating judgments. Finally, there are judgments which assert the actuality of some state of affairs. Although they can be rendered increasingly probable by tests, no set of eventualities envisioned can exhaust their significance. Lewis calls these judgments non-terminating because there are indefinitely many further tests which could, theoretically speaking, falsify the prediction and any actual verification can be no more than partial.

The ground of empirical judgments is past experience of like cases. At bottom those experiences have a warrant-producing character for a particular response because of the directly apprehended qualitative character of the signal combined with the expectations due to similar experiences in the past. In short, an empirical judgment is justified by its relation to past experiences of like cases. The warrant producing character of those experiences for a particular judgment depends upon the recognition of the presentation as classifiable with other qualitatively similar appearances as significant of future experience, and the character of the passages of experience attending past instances of the judgment. Epistemic warrant at its bottom level is the animal's recognition of future objectivity lodged in present experience; present experience is a sign of experience to come. A multi-storied interpretive structure of concepts is built upon this adaptive responsiveness. Concepts become criteria of classification because they allow us to make empirically valid judgments, and because they fit usefully in the larger structure of our concepts. The structure, viewed apart from experience, is an a priori system of concepts, but looked at in terms of experience it is a network of sense meanings. The concept of probability plays a more prominent role in AKV than it does in MWO, but it is not a role of a different kind.

Perceptual knowledge has two aspects: the givenness of the experience and the objective interpretation which, in light of past experience, we put on it. But these are both abstractions and only distinguishable by analysis. What is given in experience as spontaneously arising expectancies is already conceptually structured, to recognize the given is to classify it with qualitatively similar cases and that recognition, although spontaneous, has the logical character as a generalization. The system of concepts within which our judgments are formulated and the pyramidal structure of empirical beliefs which intend a set of possible worlds of which ours is but one, by themselves suggest a coherence theory of justification. But here, as in MWO, Lewis resists this idealist alternative. Lewis takes the given to be essential for a series of interrelated reasons. Mere coherence of a system of statements does not even give meaning; the student of Arabic mentioned earlier does not know what any of the terms mean and cannot even use a statement to express a judgment. The given thus plays the role of fixing what beliefs mean because it lodges the actual world among the various possible worlds which are compatible with my knowledge: whichever world I am in it is this one. A merely hypothetical system of congruent and consistent statements could be fabricated out of whole cloth, as a novelist does, but however richly developed, the congruence and coherence of the system would be no evidence of fact at all. Independently given facts are indispensable and they are the actually given expectancies whose objective intent we then can evaluate for their mutual congruence and coherence.

Lewis's emphasis on the given has been taken by many contemporary philosophers to be an instance of classical foundationalism. As we saw in the discussion of MWO Lewis considered the very idea of sense data to be incoherent. There is, however, a debate about whether his views changed between that book and AKV. Christopher Gowans (in "Two Concepts of the Given in C.I. Lewis, Realism and Foundationalism") has argued that Lewis had two different conceptions of the given but failed to recognize the difference between them. On this view, while Lewis was an anti-foundationalist in MWO he embraced foundationalism in AKV and his later thinking. Determining Lewis's position is, of course, a matter of interpretation. I think that a non-foundationalist position is dictated by the larger structure of his thought. He was certainly not a foundationalist in the British empiricist sense of the word.

7. Valuation and Rightness

Lewis rejected the "scandal" of emotivism and noncognitivism and directed much of his late thinking to two tasks: demonstrating that valuation is a species of empirical knowledge and establishing that there are valid nonrepudiable imperatives or principles of rightness. Lewis's acceptance of the psycho-biological model of inquiry and it's emphasis on the evolutionary and biological ground of cognition in animal adaptive response, committed him to the ineliminability of value in knowledge. Inquiry directed towards epistemic goals is, he argued, no less a species of conduct than practical and moral inquiry. Conduct of any sort will be directed towards ends appropriate to it and in light of which both its success can be measured and its aim be critiqued as reasonable or unreasonable. Lewis argued that evaluations are a form of empirical knowledge no different fundamentally from other forms of empirical knowledge regarding the determination of their truth or falsity, or of their validity or justification.

Much of Lewis's discussion takes the form of an analysis of the concepts surrounding rational agency. Purposeful activity intrinsically involves rational cognitive appraisal. Action is behavior which is deliberate in the sense of being subject to critique and alterable upon reflection. It is behavior for the sake of realizing something to which a positive value is ascribed. He characterizes an action as sensible just in case the result or its intent, is ascribed comparative value. The purpose of an act, by which he means that part of the intent of an act for the sake of which it is adopted, can also be said to be sensible because what is purposed is something to which comparative value is ascribed. An act is successful in the circumstance that it is adopted for a sensible purpose which is realized in the result.

The verification of success will depend upon the purpose for which the act is done. The success of an action aimed at an enjoyable experience can be decisively verified if that experience is attained, but typically the purpose of an act will be to bring about a state of affairs whose value-consequences extend into the future and will thus be affected by other states of affairs, and so the success of the act may never be fully verified. In addition, an act may fail of its purpose in two ways: the expected result may fail to follow or it may be realized but fail to have the value ascribed to it.

Just as there are two aspects to the validation of empirical belief, verification and justification, Lewis distinguishes the success (or verification) of an action from its practical justification, which is the character belonging to a belief just in case its intent is an expectation which is a warranted empirical belief. Given these distinctions, Lewis argues that unless values were truth-apt in the sense of being genuine empirical cognitions capable of confirmation or disconfirmation, no intention or purpose could be serious and hence no action could be justified or attain success. The enterprise of human life can only prosper, he says, if there are value judgments which are true. Those who deny it fall into a kind of practical contradiction similar to that of Epimenides the Cretan who said that all Cretans are liars. Making a judgment, framing an argument, and deciding to take an action, are all activities which involve bringing to bear cognitive criteria of classification, inference and cogency on the matter at hand. Thinking is an activity which presupposes selective and intelligent choice concerning the path of thought. Repudiation of the rational imperativeness of so selectively choosing is thus nothing less than a repudiation of the cognitive aim of thinking. All the different forms of imperatives, the epistemic and logical imperatives, the technical, prudential and moral imperatives, are of a piece: they are principles of right intellectual conduct, in short, principles of intelligent practice. The notions of correctness, conduct, objectivity and reality are all forged within the system of communal practices which give these concepts ground. Our conceptual framework is not merely a set of common concepts but also a set of communal norms regulating our conduct. We can reject these norms only by repudiating our conceptual framework, but there is no other ground of rational choice which could provide a warrant for an act of repudiation, so that the act of repudiating norms tacitly presupposes the warrant which norms provide. The skeptic's own claims constitute a reductio ad absurdum against his position.

As we saw, Lewis distinguished between three classes of empirical statement, expressive, terminating and non-terminating statements. Since valuation is a species of empirical knowledge Lewis distinguishes between three kinds of value-predications. First, there are expressive statements of found value quality as directly experienced. Such predications require no verification as they make no claim which could be subjected to test. Secondly, there are terminating evaluations which predict the success of an action aimed at some value experience as result. These can be put to test by so acting and thus are directly verifiable. Finally there are non-terminating evaluations which ascribe an objective value property to an object or state of affairs. Like any other judgment of objective empirical fact such claims are always fallible though some may attain practical certainty.

Since the aim of sensible action is the realization of some positive value in experience, only what is immediately valuable can be valuable for its own sake or intrinsically valuable. Extrinsic values divide into values which are instrumental for some thing else and values found to be inherent in objects, situations or states of affairs. Value, Lewis argues, is not a kind of quality but a dimension-like orientational mode pervading all experience. To live and to act is necessarily to be subject to imperatives, to recognize the validity of norms. The good which we seek in action is not this or that presently given value experience but a life which is good on the whole. That is something which cannot be immediately disclosed in present experience but can only be comprehended by some imaginative or synthetic envisagement of its on- the-whole quality. We are subject to imperatives because future possibilities are present in our experience only as signs of the significance which that experience has for the future if we decide to act one way rather than another. Since we are free to act or not we must move ourselves in accordance with the directive import of our experience to realize future goods. Life is not an aggregate of separate moments but a synthetic whole in which no single experience momentarily given says the last word about itself: each moment has its own fixed and unalterable character but the significance of that character for the whole, like the significance of a note within a piece of music, depends upon the character of other experiences to which it stands in relation. The value assessment of experiential wholes can never be directly certain nor decisively verified in any experience because what is to be assessed is a whole of experiences as it is experienced, and there is no moment in which this experiential whole is present. The value of experiential wholes thus essentially involves memory and narrative interpretation.

8. The Late Ethics

A discussion of Lewis's philosophy would not be complete without a discussion of his late work in ethics. Lewis's ethics, toward which the whole of his mature philosophical work aimed, is a richly developed foundation for a common sense reflective morality, broadly within the American pragmatic naturalistic tradition. No one can cogently repudiate the ethical task and it is not the special mission of any discipline. At the center of Lewis's theory of practical reason is the rational imperative. While a naturalist with respect to values, he held practical thinking in all its forms to rest for its cogency on categorically valid principles of right. Ethics, epistemology and logic are all inquiries into species of right conduct. They are kinds of thinking, subject to our deliberate self-government and thus to normative critique, and as a consequence they are all forms of practical reason.

Under the influence of Kant, he held that imperatives are rational constraints put on our thinking by our nature as rational beings. He offered several arguments including a pragmatic 'Kantian deduction' of the principles of practice, arguing that without universally valid principles of practice, our experience of ourselves as agents would be impossible. He also offered a reductio ad absurdum against the skeptic. The denial of moral imperatives is pragmatically incoherent because it in effect attempts to mount a valid argument to the conclusion that there is no such thing as validity in argument; the skeptic's attempt to deny the universal validity of such imperatives involves him in what Lewis called a pragmatic contradiction and leads by a reductio ad absurdum to the confirmation of their validity. By implicitly asking us to weigh and consider his reasons, the skeptic appeals to reasons and argument as things which should constrain us in our beliefs and decisions, whether we like it or not and thus acknowledges their force in his practice. Imperatives are not arbitrary commands or recommendations to the self; they are directly and cognitively present in the agent's experience.

Rational imperatives must underlie all forms of rational self-regulation, of which ethics proper is only one department. Arguing, concluding, believing are also forms of self-governed conduct and it is to these forms that his argument first turns. Experience itself is for Lewis dynamically shaped by our classifications and judgments; as a temporal process its present moments are pervaded by implicit judgments, expectations and valuations, grounded in past expectations and confirmations. Permeated with value and active assessment, experience is a weave of givenness and conduct, of doing and suffering. Value qualities are verifiably found in experience; objective valuations are both fallible and corrigible. They are judgments which reflect the justified expectation of good (or unfavorable) consequences on the assumption of actions envisaged. Accordingly, the evaluative ought the rational imperative is at the heart of human experience. At the beginning his 1954 Woodbridge Lectures, as The Ground and Nature of the Right , he argues "To say that a thing is right is simply to characterize it as representing the desiderated commitment of choice in any situation calling for deliberate decision. What is right is thus the question of all questions; and the distinction of right and wrong extends to every topic or reflection and to all that human self-determination of act or attitude may affect."

Despite the critical priority of the right it is in the service of the good; and Lewis's account of both reflects a single commitment to the pragmatic structure of inquiry. Ethics grows out of the fact that human beings are active creatures who enter into the process of reality in order to change it. We are also social creatures whose experience and needs are taken up thematically in the categories and organized practices which make up our social inheritance. For Lewis both what is judged justifiably to be good and what ways of achieving it are validly imperative are fallibly grounded in human experience; skepticism about either the right or the good is ultimately a failure to acknowledge that fact. Since we are endowed with the capacity to do by choosing we are obligated to exercise it. We must decide even if we choose to do nothing, and the world will be different depending on how we decide

To say that human beings are self-conscious and self-governing creatures means, for Lewis, that they perceive their environment in terms of predictively hypothetical imperatives between which they are able to choose. Beliefs and imperatives are thus only modally distinct; they contain the same information. What Lewis calls the "Law of Objectivity" is governing oneself by the advice of cognition, in contravention if necessary to our impulses and inclination. Directives of doing, determined by the good or bad results of conforming to them, fall into various modes, principally the technical, the prudential and the moral and the logical. The imperative force of technical rules presumes as antecedently determined some class of ends; they justify actions only on the assumption of the justification of those ends. The rules of technique are thus hypothetical imperatives. By contrast, the rules of the critique of consistence and cogency, of prudence and of the moral are non-repudiable; they are categorical.

In his final years Lewis worked on a book on the foundations of ethics. It is clear from his manuscripts and letters that the ethics book occupied Lewis's attention in the early forties and for the rest of his life. While it is difficult to understand why Lewis was unable to work the material into a form which satisfied him, I think that it had come to have an importance in his mind, a finality, which combined with his declining health, prevented a final satisfactory version being written for he continued to work on his ethics book writing almost daily until his death in February of 1964.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Major Works by Lewis

  • Lewis, C.I., 1929. Mind and The World Order: an Outline of a Theory of Knowledge . Charles Scribner's Sons, New York, 1929, reprinted in paperback by Dover Publications, Inc. New York, 1956.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1932a. Symbolic Logic (with C.H. Langford). New York: The Appleton-Century Company, 1932 pp. xii +506, reprinted in paperback by New York: Dover Publications, 1951.
  • Lewis,C. I., 1946. An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation , (The Paul Carus Lectures, Series 8, 1946) Open Court, La Salle, 1946.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1955a. The Ground and Nature of the Right , The Woodbridge Lectures, V, delivered at Columbia University in November 1954, New York, Columbia University Press, 1955.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1957a. Our Social Inheritance , Mahlon Powell Lectures at University of Indiana, 1956, Bloomington, Indiana, Indiana University Press, 1957.
  • Collected Papers of Clarence Irving Lewis , ed. John D. Goheen and John L. Mothershead, Jr., Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1970.
    • Includes most of Lewis's most important articles.
  • Values and Imperatives, Studies in Ethics , ed. John Lange, Stanford University Press, Stanford, California, 1969.
    • Includes a number of Lewis's late, unpublished talks on ethics.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Dayton, Eric. AC I Lewis And The Given@, Transactions of the Charles S . Peirce Society , 31(2), Spr 1995, pp. 254-284.
  • Flower, Elizabeth and Murphey, Murray G. A History of Philosophy in America , New York, G.P. Putnam's Sons, 1977, Chapter 15. pp.892-958.
  • Gowans, Christopher W. ATwo Concepts Of The Given In C I Lewis: Realism And Foundationalism@. The Journal of the History of Philosophy , 27(4), 1989, pp. 573-590.
  • Haack, Susan. "C I Lewis" In American Philosophy , Singer, Marcus G (Ed), Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1986, pp. 215-238.
  • Hill, Thomas English. Contemporary Theories of Knowledge , The Ronald Press Co., New York, 1961, chapter 12, pp. 362-387.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. The Rise of American Philosophy, New Haven, Yale University Press, 1977, chapter 28, pp. 533-562.
  • Reck, Andrew J. The New American Philosophers , Louisiana State University Press, Baton Rouge, 1968, pp. 3-43.
  • Rosenthal, Sandra B. The Pragmatic a priori: Study In The Epistemology Of C I Lewis . St Louis, Green, 1976.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur (Ed). The Philosophy Of C I Lewis . La Salle Il Open Court, 1968.
  • Thayer, H S. Meaning And Action: A Critical History Of Pragmatism. Indianapolis Bobbs-Merrill, 1968, chapter 4, pp.205-231.

 

Author Information

Eric Dayton
Email: eric.dayton@usask.ca
University of Saskatchewan
Canada

George Herbert Mead (1863—1931)

MeadGeorge Herbert Mead is a major figure in the history of American philosophy, one of the founders of Pragmatism along with Peirce, James, Tufts, and Dewey. He published numerous papers during his lifetime and, following his death, several of his students produced four books in his name from Mead's unpublished (and even unfinished) notes and manuscripts, from students' notes, and from stenographic records of some of his courses at the University of Chicago. Through his teaching, writing, and posthumous publications, Mead has exercised a significant influence in 20th century social theory, among both philosophers and social scientists. In particular, Mead's theory of the emergence of mind and self out of the social process of significant communication has become the foundation of the symbolic interactionist school of sociology and social psychology. In addition to his well- known and widely appreciated social philosophy, Mead's thought includes significant contributions to the philosophy of nature, the philosophy of science, philosophical anthropology, the philosophy of history, and process philosophy. Both John Dewey and Alfred North Whitehead considered Mead a thinker of the highest order.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Social Theory
    1. Communication and Mind
    2. Action
    3. Self and Other
  4. The Temporal Structure of Human Existence
  5. Perception and Reflection: Mead's Theory of Perspectives
  6. Philosophy of History
    1. The Nature of History
    2. History and Self-Consciousness
    3. History and the Idea of the Future
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

George Herbert Mead was born in South Hadley, Massachusetts, on February 27, 1863, and he died in Chicago, Illinois, on April 26, 1931. He was the second child of Hiram Mead (d. 1881), a Congregationalist minister and pastor of the South Hadley Congregational Church, and Elizabeth Storrs Billings (1832-1917). George Herbert's older sister, Alice, was born in 1859. In 1870, the family moved to Oberlin, Ohio, where Hiram Mead became professor of homiletics at the Oberlin Theological Seminary, a position he held until his death in 1881. After her husband's death, Elizabeth Storrs Billings Mead taught for two years at Oberlin College and subsequently, from 1890 to 1900, served as president of Mount Holyoke College in South Hadley, Massachusetts.

George Herbert Mead entered Oberlin College in 1879 at the age of sixteen and graduated with a BA degree in 1883. While at Oberlin, Mead and his best friend, Henry Northrup Castle, became enthusiastic students of literature, poetry, and history, and staunch opponents of supernaturalism. In literature, Mead was especially interested in Wordsworth, Shelley, Carlyle, Shakespeare, Keats, and Milton; and in history, he concentrated on the writings of Macauley, Buckle, and Motley. Mead published an article on Charles Lamb in the 1882-3 issue of the Oberlin Review (15-16).

Upon graduating from Oberlin in 1883, Mead took a grade school teaching job, which, however, lasted only four months. Mead was let go because of the way in which he handled discipline problems: he would simply dismiss uninterested and disruptive students from his class and send them home.

From the end of 1883 through the summer of 1887, Mead was a surveyor with the Wisconsin Central Rail Road Company. He worked on the project that resulted in the eleven- hundred mile railroad line that ran from Minneapolis, Minnesota, to Moose Jaw, Saskatchewan, and which connected there with the Canadian Pacific railroad line.

Mead earned his MA degree in philosophy at Harvard University during the 1887-1888 academic year. While majoring in philosophy, he also studied psychology, Greek, Latin, German, and French. Among his philosophy professors were George H. Palmer (1842-1933) and Josiah Royce (1855-1916). During this time, Mead was most influenced by Royce's Romanticism and idealism.

Since Mead was later to become one of the major figures in the American Pragmatist movement, it is interesting that, while at Harvard, he did not study under William James (1842-1910) (although he lived in James's home as tutor to the James children).

In the summer of 1888, Mead's friend, Henry Castle and his sister, Helen, had traveled to Europe and had settled temporarily in Leipzig, Germany. Later, in the early fall of 1888, Mead, too, went to Leipzig in order to pursue a Ph.D. degree in philosophy and physiological psychology. During the 1888-1889 academic year at the University of Leipzig, Mead became strongly interested in Darwinism and studied with Wilhelm Wundt (1832-1920) and G. Stanley Hall (1844-1924) (two major founders of experimental psychology). On Hall's recommendation, Mead transferred to the University of Berlin in the spring of 1889, where he concentrated on the study of physiological psychology and economic theory.

While Mead and his friends, the Castles, were staying in Leipzig, a romance between Mead and Helen Castle developed, and they were subsequently married in Berlin on October 1, 1891. Prior to George and Helen's marriage, Henry Castle had married Frieda Stechner of Leipzig, and Henry and his bride had returned to Cambridge, Massachusetts, where Henry continued his studies in law at Harvard.

Mead's work on his Ph.D. degree was interrupted in the spring of 1891 by the offer of an instructorship in philosophy and psychology at the University of Michigan. This was to replace James Hayden Tufts (1862-1942), who was leaving Michigan in order to complete his Ph.D. degree at the University of Freiburg. Mead took the job and never thereafter resumed his own Ph.D. studies

Mead worked at the University of Michigan from the fall of 1891 through the spring of 1894. He taught both philosophy and psychology. At Michigan, he became acquainted with and influenced by the work of sociologist Charles Horton Cooley (1864-1929), psychologist Alfred Lloyd, and philosopher John Dewey (1859-1952). Mead and Dewey became close personal and intellectual friends, finding much common ground in their interests in philosophy and psychology. In those days, the lines between philosophy and psychology were not sharply drawn, and Mead was to teach and do research in psychology throughout his career (mostly social psychology after 1910).

George and Helen Mead's only child, Henry Castle Albert Mead, was born in Ann Arbor in 1892. When the boy grew up, he became a physician and married Irene Tufts (James Hayden Tufts' daughter), a psychiatrist.

In 1892, having completed his Ph.D. work at Freiburg, James Hayden Tufts received an administrative appointment at the newly-created University of Chicago to help its founding president, William Rainey Harper, organize the new university (which opened in the fall of 1892). The University of Chicago was organized around three main departments: Semitics, chaired by J.M. Powis Smith; Classics, chaired by Paul Shorey; and Philosophy, chaired by John Dewey as of 1894. Dewey was recommended for that position by Tufts, and Dewey agreed to move from the University of Michigan to the University of Chicago provided that his friend and colleague, George Herbert Mead, was given a position as assistant professor in the Chicago philosophy department.

Thus, the University of Chicago became the new center of American Pragmatism (which had earlier originated with Charles Sanders Peirce [1839-1914] and William James at Harvard). The "Chicago Pragmatists" were led by Tufts, Dewey, and Mead. Dewey left Chicago for Columbia University in 1904, leaving Tufts and Mead as the major spokesmen for the Pragmatist movement in Chicago.

Mead spent the rest of his life in Chicago. He was assistant professor of philosophy from 1894-1902; associate professor from 1902-1907; and full professor from 1907 until his death in 1931. During those years, Mead made substantial contributions in both social psychology and philosophy. Mead's major contribution to the field of social psychology was his attempt to show how the human self arises in the process of social interaction, especially by way of linguistic communication ("symbolic interaction"). In philosophy, as already mentioned, Mead was one of the major American Pragmatists. As such, he pursued and furthered the Pragmatist program and developed his own distinctive philosophical outlook centered around the concepts of sociality and temporality (see below).

Mrs. Helen Castle Mead died on December 25, 1929. George Mead was hit hard by her passing and gradually became ill himself. John Dewey arranged for Mead's appointment as a professor in the philosophy department at Columbia University as of the 1931-1932 academic year, but before he could take up that appointment, Mead died in Chicago on April 26, 1931.

2. Writings

During his more-than-40-year career, Mead thought deeply, wrote almost constantly, and published numerous articles and book reviews in philosophy and psychology. However, he never published a book. After his death, several of his students edited four volumes from stenographic records of his social psychology course at the University of Chicago, from Mead's lecture notes, and from Mead's numerous unpublished papers. The four books are The Philosophy of the Present (1932), edited by Arthur E. Murphy; Mind, Self, and Society (1934), edited by Charles W. Morris; Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century (1936), edited by Merritt H. Moore; and The Philosophy of the Act (1938), Mead's Carus Lectures of 1930, edited by Charles W. Morris.

Notable among Mead's published papers are the following: "Suggestions Towards a Theory of the Philosophical Disciplines" (1900); "Social Consciousness and the Consciousness of Meaning" (1910); "What Social Objects Must Psychology Presuppose" (1910); "The Mechanism of Social Consciousness" (1912); "The Social Self" (1913); "Scientific Method and the Individual Thinker" (1917); "A Behavioristic Account of the Significant Symbol" (1922); "The Genesis of Self and Social Control" (1925); "The Objective Reality of Perspectives" (1926);"The Nature of the Past" (1929); and "The Philosophies of Royce, James, and Dewey in Their American Setting" (1929). Twenty-five of Mead's most notable published articles have been collected in Selected Writings: George Herbert Mead, edited by Andrew J. Reck (Bobbs-Merrill, The Liberal Arts Press, 1964).

Most of Mead's writings and much of the secondary literature thereon are listed in the References and Further Reading, below.

3. Social Theory

a. Communication and Mind

In Mind, Self and Society (1934), Mead describes how the individual mind and self arises out of the social process. Instead of approaching human experience in terms of individual psychology, Mead analyzes experience from the "standpoint of communication as essential to the social order." Individual psychology, for Mead, is intelligible only in terms of social processes. The "development of the individual's self, and of his self- consciousness within the field of his experience" is preeminently social. For Mead, the social process is prior to the structures and processes of individual experience.

Mind, according to Mead, arises within the social process of communication and cannot be understood apart from that process. The communicational process involves two phases: (1) the "conversation of gestures" and (2) language, or the "conversation of significant gestures." Both phases presuppose a social context within which two or more individuals are in interaction with one another.

Mead introduces the idea of the "conversation of gestures" with his famous example of the dog-fight:

Dogs approaching each other in hostile attitude carry on such a language of gestures. They walk around each other, growling and snapping, and waiting for the opportunity to attack . . . . (Mind, Self and Society 14) The act of each dog becomes the stimulus to the other dog for his response. There is then a relationship between these two; and as the act is responded to by the other dog, it, in turn, undergoes change. The very fact that the dog is ready to attack another becomes a stimulus to the other dog to change his own position or his own attitude. He has no sooner done this than the change of attitude in the second dog in turn causes the first dog to change his attitude. We have here a conversation of gestures. They are not, however, gestures in the sense that they are significant. We do not assume that the dog says to himself, "If the animal comes from this direction he is going to spring at my throat and I will turn in such a way." What does take place is an actual change in his own position due to the direction of the approach of the other dog. (Mind, Self and Society 42-43, emphasis added).

In the conversation of gestures, communication takes place without an awareness on the part of the individual of the response that her gesture elicits in others; and since the individual is unaware of the reactions of others to her gestures, she is unable to respond to her own gestures from the standpoint of others. The individual participant in the conversation of gestures is communicating, but she does not know that she is communicating. The conversation of gestures, that is, is unconscious communication.

It is, however, out of the conversation of gestures that language, or conscious communication, emerges. Mead's theory of communication is evolutionary: communication develops from more or less primitive toward more or less advanced forms of social interaction. In the human world, language supersedes (but does not abolish) the conversation of gestures and marks the transition from non-significant to significant interaction.

Language, in Mead's view, is communication through significant symbols. A significant symbol is a gesture (usually a vocal gesture) that calls out in the individual making the gesture the same (that is, functionally identical) response that is called out in others to whom the gesture is directed (Mind, Self and Society 47).

Significant communication may also be defined as the comprehension by the individual of the meaning of her gestures. Mead describes the communicational process as a social act since it necessarily requires at least two individuals in interaction with one another. It is within this act that meaning arises. The act of communication has a triadic structure consisting of the following components: (1) an initiating gesture on the part of an individual; (2) a response to that gesture by a second individual; and (3) the result of the action initiated by the first gesture (Mind, Self and Society 76, 81). There is no meaning independent of the interactive participation of two or more individuals in the act of communication.

Of course, the individual can anticipate the responses of others and can therefore consciously and intentionally make gestures that will bring out appropriate responses in others. This form of communication is quite different from that which takes place in the conversation of gestures, for in the latter there is no possibility of the conscious structuring and control of the communicational act.

Consciousness of meaning is that which permits the individual to respond to her own gestures as the other responds. A gesture, then, is an action that implies a reaction. The reaction is the meaning of the gesture and points toward the result (the "intentionality") of the action initiated by the gesture. Gestures "become significant symbols when they implicitly arouse in an individual making them the same responses which they explicitly arouse, or are supposed [intended] to arouse, in other individuals, the individuals to whom they are addressed" (Mind, Self and Society 47). For example, "You ask somebody to bring a visitor a chair. You arouse the tendency to get the chair in the other, but if he is slow to act, you get the chair yourself. The response to the gesture is the doing of a certain thing, and you arouse that same tendency in yourself" (Mind, Self and Society 67). At this stage, the conversation of gestures is transformed into a conversation of significant symbols.

There is a certain ambiguity in Mead's use of the terms "meaning" and "significance." The question is, can a gesture be meaningful without being significant? But, if the meaning of a gesture is the response to that gesture, then there is meaning in the (non-significant) conversation of gestures — the second dog, after all, responds to the gestures of the first dog in the dog- fight and vice-versa.

However, it is the conversation of significant symbols that is the foundation of Mead's theory of mind. "Only in terms of gestures as significant symbols is the existence of mind or intelligence possible; for only in terms of gestures which are significant symbols can thinking — which is simply an internalized or implicit conversation of the individual with himself by means of such gestures — take place" (Mind, Self and Society 47). Mind, then, is a form of participation in an interpersonal (that is, social) process; it is the result of taking the attitudes of others toward one's own gestures (or conduct in general). Mind, in brief, is the use of significant symbols.

The essence of Mead's so-called "social behaviorism" is his view that mind is an emergent out of the interaction of organic individuals in a social matrix. Mind is not a substance located in some transcendent realm, nor is it merely a series of events that takes place within the human physiological structure. Mead therefore rejects the traditional view of the mind as a substance separate from the body as well as the behavioristic attempt to account for mind solely in terms of physiology or neurology. Mead agrees with the behaviorists that we can explain mind behaviorally if we deny its existence as a substantial entity and view it instead as a natural function of human organisms. But it is neither possible nor desirable to deny the existence of mind altogether. The physiological organism is a necessary but not sufficient condition of mental behavior (Mind, Self and Society 139). Without the peculiar character of the human central nervous system, internalization by the individual of the process of significant communication would not be possible; but without the social process of conversational behavior, there would be no significant symbols for the individual to internalize.

The emergence of mind is contingent upon interaction between the human organism and its social environment; it is through participation in the social act of communication that the individual realizes her (physiological and neurological) potential for significantly symbolic behavior (that is, thought). Mind, in Mead's terms, is the individualized focus of the communicational process — it is linguistic behavior on the part of the individual. There is, then, no "mind or thought without language;" and language (the content of mind) "is only a development and product of social interaction" (Mind, Self and Society 191- 192). Thus, mind is not reducible to the neurophysiology of the organic individual, but is an emergent in "the dynamic, ongoing social process" that constitutes human experience (Mind, Self and Society 7).

b. Action

For Mead, mind arises out of the social act of communication. Mead's concept of the social act is relevant, not only to his theory of mind, but to all facets of his social philosophy. His theory of "mind, self, and society" is, in effect, a philosophy of the act from the standpoint of a social process involving the interaction of many individuals, just as his theory of knowledge and value is a philosophy of the act from the standpoint of the experiencing individual in interaction with an environment.

There are two models of the act in Mead's general philosophy: (1) the model of the act-as-such, i.e., organic activity in general (which is elaborated in The Philosophy of the Act), and (2) the model of the social act, i.e., social activity, which is a special case of organic activity and which is of particular (although not exclusive) relevance in the interpretation of human experience. The relation between the "social process of behavior" and the "social environment" is "analogous" to the relation between the "individual organism" and the "physical-biological environment" (Mind, Self and Society 130).

The Act-As-Such

In his analysis of the act-as-such (that is, organic activity), Mead speaks of the act as determining "the relation between the individual and the environment" (The Philosophy of the Act 364). Reality, according to Mead, is a field of situations. "These situations are fundamentally characterized by the relation of an organic individual to his environment or world. The world, things, and the individual are what they are because of this relation [between the individual and his world]" (The Philosophy of the Act 215). It is by way of the act that the relation between the individual and his world is defined and developed.

Mead describes the act as developing in four stages: (1) the stage of impulse, upon which the organic individual responds to "problematic situations" in his experience (e.g., the intrusion of an enemy into the individual's field of existence); (2) the stage of perception, upon which the individual defines and analyzes his problem (e.g., the direction of the enemy's attack is sensed, and a path leading in the opposite direction is selected as an avenue of escape); (3) the stage of manipulation, upon which action is taken with reference to the individual's perceptual appraisal of the problematic situation (e.g., the individual runs off along the path and away from his enemy); and (4) the stage of consummation, upon which the encountered difficulty is resolved and the continuity of organic existence re- established (e.g., the individual escapes his enemy and returns to his ordinary affairs) (The Philosophy of the Act 3-25). ]

What is of interest in this description is that the individual is not merely a passive recipient of external, environmental influences, but is capable of taking action with reference to such influences; he reconstructs his relation to his environment through selective perception and through the use or manipulation of the objects selected in perception (e.g., the path of escape mentioned above). The objects in the environment are, so to speak, created through the activity of the organic individual: the path along which the individual escapes was not "there" (in his thoughts or perceptions) until the individual needed a path of escape. Reality is not simply "out there," independent of the organic individual, but is the outcome of the dynamic interrelation of organism and environment. Perception, according to Mead, is a relation between organism and object. Perception is not, then, something that occurs in the organism, but is an objective relation between the organism and its environment; and the perceptual object is not an entity out there, independent of the organism, but is one pole of the interactive perceptual process (The Philosophy of the Act 81).

Objects of perception arise within the individual's attempt to solve problems that have emerged in his experience, problems that are, in an important sense, determined by the individual himself. The character of the individual's environment is predetermined by the individual's sensory capacities. The environment, then, is what it is in relation to a sensuous and selective organic individual; and things, or objects, "are what they are in the relationship between the individual and his environment, and this relationship is that of conduct [i.e., action]" (The Philosophy of the Act 218).
The Social Act
While the social act is analogous to the act-as-such, the above-described model of "individual biological activity" (Mind, Self and Society 130) will not suffice as an analysis of social experience. The "social organism" is not an organic individual, but "a social group of individual organisms" (Mind, Self and Society 130). The human individual, then, is a member of a social organism, and his acts must be viewed in the context of social acts that involve other individuals. Society is not a collection of preexisting atomic individuals (as suggested, for example, by Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau), but rather a processual whole within which individuals define themselves through participation in social acts. The acts of the individual are, according to Mead, aspects of acts that are trans- individual. "For social psychology, the whole (society) is prior to the part (the individual), not the part to the whole; and the part is explained in terms of the whole, not the whole in terms of the part or parts" (Mind, Self and Society 7). Thus, the social act is a "dynamic whole," a "complex organic process," within which the individual is situated, and it is within this situation that individual acts are possible and have meaning.

Mead defines the social act in relation to the social object. The social act is a collective act involving the participation of two or more individuals; and the social object is a collective object having a common meaning for each participant in the act. There are many kinds of social acts, some very simple, some very complex. These range from the (relatively) simple interaction of two individuals (e.g., in dancing, in love-making, or in a game of handball), to rather more complex acts involving more than two individuals (e.g., a play, a religious ritual, a hunting expedition), to still more complex acts carried on in the form of social organizations and institutions (e.g., law- enforcement, education, economic exchange). The life of a society consists in the aggregate of such social acts.

It is by way of the social act that persons in society create their reality. The objects of the social world (common objects such as clothes, furniture, tools, as well as scientific objects such as atoms and electrons) are what they are as a result of being defined and utilized within the matrix of specific social acts. Thus, an animal skin becomes a coat in the experience of people (e.g., barbarians or pretenders to aristocracy) engaged in the social act of covering and/or adorning their bodies; and the electron is introduced (as a hypothetical object) in the scientific community's project of investigating the ultimate nature of physical reality.

Communication through significant symbols is that which renders the intelligent organization of social acts possible. Significant communication, as stated earlier, involves the comprehension of meaning, i.e., the taking of the attitude of others toward one's own gestures. Significant communication among individuals creates a world of common (symbolic) meanings within which further and deliberate social acts are possible. The specifically human social act, in other words, is rooted in the act of significant communication and is, in fact, ordered by the conversation of significant symbols.

In addition to its role in the organization of the social act, significant communication is also fundamentally involved in the creation of social objects. For it is by way of significant symbols that humans indicate to one another the object relevant to their collective acts. For example, suppose that a group of people has decided on a trip to the zoo. One of the group offers to drive the others in his car; and the others respond by following the driver to his vehicle. The car has thus become an object for all members of the group, and they all make use of it to get to the zoo. Prior to this particular project of going to the zoo, the car did not have the specific significance that it takes on in becoming instrumental in the zoo-trip. The car was, no doubt, an object in some other social act prior to its incorporation into the zoo-trip; but prior to that incorporation, it was not specifically and explicitly a means of transportation to the zoo. Whatever it was, however, would be determined by its role in some social act (e.g., the owner's project of getting to work each day, etc.). It is perhaps needless to point out that the decision to go to the zoo, as well as the decision to use the car in question as a means of transportation, was made through a conversation involving significant symbols. The significant symbol functions here to indicate "some object or other within the field of social behavior, an object of common interest to all the individuals involved in the given social act thus directed toward or upon that object" (Mind, Self and Society 46). The reality that humans experience is, for Mead, very largely socially constructed in a process mediated and facilitated by the use of significant symbols.

c. Self and Other

The Self as Social Emergent

The self, like the mind, is a social emergent. This social conception of the self, Mead argues, entails that individual selves are the products of social interaction and not the (logical or biological) preconditions of that interaction. Mead contrasts his social theory of the self with individualistic theories of the self (that is, theories that presuppose the priority of selves to social process). "The self is something which has a development; it is not initially there, at birth, but arises in the process of social experience and activity, that is, develops in the given individual as a result of his relations to that process as a whole and to other individuals within that process" (Mind, Self and Society 135). Mead's model of society is an organic model in which individuals are related to the social process as bodily parts are related to bodies.

The self is a reflective process — i.e., "it is an object to itself." For Mead, it is the reflexivity of the self that "distinguishes it from other objects and from the body." For the body and other objects are not objects to themselves as the self is.

It is perfectly true that the eye can see the foot, but it does not see the body as a whole. We cannot see our backs; we can feel certain portions of them, if we are agile, but we cannot get an experience of our whole body. There are, of course, experiences which are somewhat vague and difficult of location, but the bodily experiences are for us organized about a self. The foot and hand belong to the self. We can see our feet, especially if we look at them from the wrong end of an opera glass, as strange things which we have difficulty in recognizing as our own. The parts of the body are quite distinguishable from the self. We can lose parts of the body without any serious invasion of the self. The mere ability to experience different parts of the body is not different from the experience of a table. The table presents a different feel from what the hand does when one hand feels another, but it is an experience of something with which we come definitely into contact. The body does not experience itself as a whole, in the sense in which the self in some way enters into the experience of the self (Mind, Self and Society 136).

It is, moreover, this reflexivity of the self that distinguishes human from animal consciousness (Mind, Self and Society, fn., 137). Mead points out two uses of the term "consciousness": (1) "consciousness" may denote "a certain feeling consciousness" which is the outcome of an organism's sensitivity to its environment (in this sense, animals, in so far as they act with reference to events in their environments, are conscious); and (2) "consciousness" may refer to a form of awareness "which always has, implicitly at least, the reference to an 'I' in it" (that is, the term "consciousness" may mean self- consciousness) (Mind, Self and Society 165). It is the second use of the term "consciousness" that is appropriate to the discussion of human consciousness. While there is a form of pre-reflective consciousness that refers to the "bare thereness of the world," it is reflective (or self-) consciousness that characterizes human awareness. The pre-reflective world is a world in which the self is absent (Mind, Self and Society 135-136).

Self-consciousness, then, involves the objectification of the self. In the mode of self- consciousness, the "individual enters as such into his own experience . . . as an object" (Mind, Self and Society 225). How is this objectification of the self possible? The individual, according to Mead, "can enter as an object [to himself] only on the basis of social relations and interactions, only by means of his experiential transactions with other individuals in an organized social environment" (Mind, Self and Society 225). Self-consciousness is the result of a process in which the individual takes the attitudes of others toward herself, in which she attempts to view herself from the standpoint of others. The self-as-object arises out of the individual's experience of other selves outside of herself. The objectified self is an emergent within the social structures and processes of human intersubjectivity.

Symbolic Interaction and the Emergence of the Self

Mead's account of the social emergence of the self is developed further through an elucidation of three forms of inter-subjective activity: language, play, and the game. These forms of "symbolic interaction" (that is, social interactions that take place via shared symbols such as words, definitions, roles, gestures, rituals, etc.) are the major paradigms in Mead's theory of socialization and are the basic social processes that render the reflexive objectification of the self possible.

Language, as we have seen, is communication via "significant symbols," and it is through significant communication that the individual is able to take the attitudes of others toward herself. Language is not only a "necessary mechanism" of mind, but also the primary social foundation of the self:

I know of no other form of behavior than the linguistic in which the individual is an object to himself . . . (Mind, Self and Society 142). When a self does appear it always involves an experience of another; there could not be an experience of a self simply by itself. The plant or the lower animal reacts to its environment, but there is no experience of a self . . . . When the response of the other becomes an essential part in the experience or conduct of the individual; when taking the attitude of the other becomes an essential part in his behavior — then the individual appears in his own experience as a self; and until this happens he does not appear as a self (Mind, Self and Society 195).

Within the linguistic act, the individual takes the role of the other, i.e., responds to her own gestures in terms of the symbolized attitudes of others. This "process of taking the role of the other" within the process of symbolic interaction is the primal form of self-objectification and is essential to self- realization (Mind, Self and Society 160-161).

It ought to be clear, then, that the self-as-object of which Mead speaks is not an object in a mechanistic, billiard ball world of external relations, but rather it is a basic structure of human experience that arises in response to other persons in an organic social-symbolic world of internal (and inter- subjective) relations. This becomes even clearer in Mead's interpretation of playing and gaming. In playing and gaming, as in linguistic activity, the key to the generation of self-consciousness is the process of role-playing." In play, the child takes the role of another and acts as though she were the other (e.g., mother, doctor, nurse, Indian, and countless other symbolized roles). This form of role-playing involves a single role at a time. Thus, the other which comes into the child's experience in play is a "specific other" (The Philosophy of the Present 169).

The game involves a more complex form of role-playing than that involved in play. In the game, the individual is required to internalize, not merely the character of a single and specific other, but the roles of all others who are involved with him in the game. He must, moreover, comprehend the rules of the game which condition the various roles (Mind, Self and Society 151). This configuration of roles-organized-according-to- rules brings the attitudes of all participants together to form a symbolized unity: this unity is the "generalized other" (Mind, Self and Society 154). The generalized other is "an organized and generalized attitude" (Mind, Self and Society 195) with reference to which the individual defines her own conduct. When the individual can view herself from the standpoint of the generalized other, "self- consciousness in the full sense of the term" is attained.

The game, then, is the stage of the social process at which the individual attains selfhood. One of Mead's most outstanding contributions to the development of critical social theory is his analysis of games. Mead elucidates the full social and psychological significance of game-playing and the extent to which the game functions as an instrument of social control. The following passage contains a remarkable piece of analysis:

What goes on in the game goes on in the life of the child all the time. He is continually taking the attitudes of those about him, especially the roles of those who in some sense control him and on whom he depends. He gets the function of the process in an abstract way at first. It goes over from the play into the game in a real sense. He has to play the game. The morale of the game takes hold of the child more than the larger morale of the whole community. The child passes into the game and the game expresses a social situation in which he can completely enter; its morale may have a greater hold on him than that of the family to which he belongs or the community in which he lives. There are all sorts of social organizations, some of which are fairly lasting, some temporary, into which the child is entering, and he is playing a sort of social game in them. It is a period in which he likes "to belong," and he gets into organizations which come into existence and pass out of existence. He becomes a something which can function in the organized whole, and thus tends to determine himself in his relationship with the group to which he belongs. That process is one which is a striking stage in the development of the child's morale. It constitutes him a self-conscious member of the community to which he belongs (Mind, Self and Society 160, emphasis added).

The "Me" and the "I"

Although the self is a product of socio-symbolic interaction, it is not merely a passive reflection of the generalized other. The individual's response to the social world is active; she decides what she will do in the light of the attitudes of others; but her conduct is not mechanically determined by such attitudinal structures. There are, it would appear, two phases (or poles) of the self: (1) that phase which reflects the attitude of the generalized other and (2) that phase which responds to the attitude of the generalized other. Here, Mead distinguishes between the "me" and the "I." The "me" is the social self, and the "I" is a response to the "me" (Mind, Self and Society 178). "The 'I' is the response of the organism to the attitudes of the others; the 'me' is the organized set of attitudes of others which one himself assumes" (Mind, Self and Society 175). Mead defines the "me" as "a conventional, habitual individual," and the "I" as the "novel reply" of the individual to the generalized other (Mind, Self and Society 197). There is a dialectical relationship between society and the individual; and this dialectic is enacted on the intra-psychic level in terms of the polarity of the "me" and the "I." The "me" is the internalization of roles which derive from such symbolic processes as linguistic interaction, playing, and gaming; whereas the "I" is a "creative response" to the symbolized structures of the "me" (that is, to the generalized other).

Although the "I" is not an object of immediate experience, it is, in a sense, knowable (that is, objectifiable). The "I" is apprehended in memory; but in the memory image, the "I" is no longer a pure subject, but "a subject that is now an object of observation" (Selected Writings 142). We can understand the structural and functional significance of the "I," but we cannot observe it directly — it appears only ex post facto. We remember the responses of the "I" to the "me;" and this is as close as we can get to a concrete knowledge of the "I." The objectification of the "I" is possible only through an awareness of the past; but the objectified "I" is never the subject of present experience. "If you ask, then, where directly in your own experience the 'I' comes in, the answer is that it comes in as a historical figure" (Mind, Self and Society 174).

The "I" appears as a symbolized object in our consciousness of our past actions, but then it has become part of the "me." The "me" is, in a sense, that phase of the self that represents the past (that is, the already-established generalized other). The "I," which is a response to the "me," represents action in a present (that is, "that which is actually going on, taking place") and implies the restructuring of the "me" in a future. After the "I" has acted, "we can catch it in our memory and place it in terms of that which we have done," but it is now (in the newly emerged present) an aspect of the restructured "me" (Mind, Self and Society 204, 203).

Because of the temporal-historical dimension of the self, the character of the "I" is determinable only after it has occurred; the "I" is not, therefore, subject to predetermination. Particular acts of the "I" become aspects of the "me" in the sense that they are objectified through memory; but the "I" as such is not contained in the "me."

The human individual exists in a social situation and responds to that situation. The situation has a particular character, but this character does not completely determine the response of the individual; there seem to be alternative courses of action. The individual must select a course of action (and even a decision to do "nothing" is a response to the situation) and act accordingly, but the course of action she selects is not dictated by the situation. It is this indeterminacy of response that "gives the sense of freedom, of initiative" (Mind, Self and Society 177). The action of the "I" is revealed only in the action itself; specific prediction of the action of the "I" is not possible. The individual is determined to respond, but the specific character of her response is not fully determined. The individual's responses are conditioned, but not determined by the situation in which she acts (Mind, Self and Society 210-211). Human freedom is conditioned freedom.

Thus, the "I" and the "me" exist in dynamic relation to one another. The human personality (or self) arises in a social situation. This situation structures the "me" by means of inter-subjective symbolic processes (language, gestures, play, games, etc.), and the active organism, as it continues to develop, must respond to its situation and to its "me." This response of the active organism is the "I."

The individual takes the attitude of the "me" or the attitude of the "I" according to situations in which she finds herself. For Mead, "both aspects of the 'I' and the 'me' are essential to the self in its full expression" (Mind, Self and Society 199). Both community and individual autonomy are necessary to identity. The "I" is process breaking through structure. The "me" is a necessary symbolic structure which renders the action of the "I" possible, and "without this structure of things, the life of the self would become impossible" (Mind, Self and Society 214).

The Dialectic of Self and Other

The self arises when the individual takes the attitude of the generalized other toward herself. This "internalization" of the generalized other occurs through the individual's participation in the conversation of significant symbols (that is, language) and in other socialization processes (e.g., play and games). The self, then, is of great value to organized society: the internalization of the conversation of significant symbols and of other interactional symbolic structures allows for "the superior co-ordination" of "society as a whole," and for the "increased efficiency of the individual as a member of the group" (Mind, Self and Society 179). The generalized other (internalized in the "me") is a major instrument of social control; it is the mechanism by which the community gains control "over the conduct of its individual members" (Mind, Self and Society 155)."Social control," in Mead's words, "is the expression of the 'me' over against the expression of the 'I'" (Mind, Self and Society 210).

The genesis of the self in social process is thus a condition of social control. The self is a social emergent that supports the cohesion of the group; individual will is harmonized, by means of a socially defined and symbolized "reality," with social goals and values. "In so far as there are social acts," writes Mead, "there are social objects, and I take it that social control is bringing the act of the individual into relation with this social object" (The Philosophy of the Act 191). Thus, there are two dimensions of Mead's theory of internalization: (1) the internalization of the attitudes of others toward oneself and toward one another (that is, internalization of the interpersonal process); and (2) the internalization of the attitudes of others "toward the various phases or aspects of the common social activity or set of social undertakings in which, as members of an organized society or social group, they are all engaged" (Mind, Self and Society 154-155).

The self, then, has reference, not only to others, but to social projects and goals, and it is by means of the socialization process (that is, the internalization of the generalized other through language, play, and the game) that the individual is brought to "assume the attitudes of those in the group who are involved with him in his social activities" (The Philosophy of the Act 192). By learning to speak, gesture, and play in "appropriate" ways, the individual is brought into line with the accepted symbolized roles and rules of the social process. The self is therefore one of the most subtle and effective instruments of social control.

For Mead, however, social control has its limits. One of these limits is the phenomenon of the "I," as described in the preceding section. Another limit to social control is presented in Mead's description of specific social relations. This description has important consequences regarding the way in which the concept of the generalized other is to be applied in social analysis.

The self emerges out of "a special set of social relations with all the other individuals" involved in a given set of social projects (Mind, Self and Society 156-157). The self is always a reflection of specific social relations that are themselves founded on the specific mode of activity of the group in question. The concept of property, for example, presupposes a community with certain kinds of responses; the idea of property has specific social and historical foundations and symbolizes the interests and values of specific social groups.

Mead delineates two types of social groups in civilized communities. There are, on the one hand, "concrete social classes or subgroups" in which "individual members are directly related to one another." On the other hand, there are "abstract social classes or subgroups" in which "individual members are related to one another only more or less indirectly, and which only more or less indirectly function as social units, but which afford unlimited possibilities for the widening and ramifying and enriching of the social relations among all the individual members of the given society as an organized and unified whole" (Mind, Self and Society 157). Such abstract social groups provide the opportunity for a radical extension of the "definite social relations" which constitute the individual's sense of self and which structure her conduct.

Human society, then, contains a multiplicity of generalized others. The individual is capable of holding membership in different groups, both simultaneously and serially, and may therefore relate herself to different generalized others at different times; or she may extend her conception of the generalized other by identifying herself with a "larger" community than the one in which she has hitherto been involved (e.g., she may come to view herself as a member of a nation rather than as a member of a tribe). The self is not confined within the limits of any one generalized other. It is true that the self arises through the internalization of the generalized attitudes of others, but there is, it would appear, no absolute limit to the individual's capacity to encompass new others within the dynamic structure of the self. This makes strict and total social control difficult if not impossible.

Mead's description of social relations also has interesting implications vis-a-vis the sociological problem of the relation between consensus and conflict in society. It is clear that both consensus and conflict are significant dimensions of social process; and in Mead's view, the problem is not to decide either for a consensus model of society or for a conflict model, but to describe as directly as possible the function of both consensus and conflict in human social life.

There are two models of consensus-conflict relation in Mead's analysis of social relations. These may be schematized as follows:

  1. Intra-Group Consensus — Extra-Group Conflict
  2. Intra-Group Conflict — Extra-Group Consensus

In the first model, the members of a given group are united in opposition to another group which is characterized as the "common enemy" of all members of the first group. Mead points out that the idea of a common enemy is central in much of human social organization and that it is frequently the major reference-point of intra-group consensus. For example, a great many human organizations derive their raison d'etre and their sense of solidarity from the existence (or putative existence) of the "enemy" (communists, atheists, infidels, fascist pigs, religious "fanatics," liberals, conservatives, or whatever). The generalized other of such an organization is formed in opposition to the generalized other of the enemy. The individual is "with" the members of her group and "against" members of the enemy group.

Mead's second model, that of intra-group conflict and extra-group consensus, is employed in his description of the process in which the individual reacts against her own group. The individual opposes her group by appealing to a "higher sort of community" that she holds to be superior to her own. She may do this by appealing to the past (e.g., she may ground her criticism of the bureaucratic state in a conception of "Jeffersonian Democracy"), or by appealing to the future (e.g., she may point to the ideal of "all mankind," of the universal community, an ideal that has the future as its ever-receding reference point). Thus, intra-group conflict is carried on in terms of an extra-group consensus, even if the consensus is merely assumed or posited. This model presupposes Mead's conception of the multiplicity of generalized others, i.e., the field within which conflicts are possible. It is also true that the individual can criticize her group only in so far as she can symbolize to herself the generalized other of that group; otherwise she would have nothing to criticize, nor would she have the motivation to do so. It is in this sense that social criticism presupposes social- symbolic process and a social self capable of symbolic reflexive activity.

In addition to the above-described models of consensus-conflict relation, Mead also points out an explicitly temporal interaction between consensus and conflict. Human conflicts often lead to resolutions that create new forms of consensus. Thus, when such conflicts occur, they can lead to whole "reconstructions of the particular social situations" that are the contexts of the conflicts (e.g., a war between two nations may be followed by new political alignments in which the two warring nations become allies). Such reconstructions of society are effected by the minds of individuals in conflict and constitute enlargements of the social whole.

An interesting consequence of Mead's analysis of social conflict is that the reconstruction of society will entail the reconstruction of the self. This aspect of the social dynamic is particularly clear in terms of Mead's concept of intra-group conflict and his description of the dialectic of the "me" and the "I." As pointed out earlier, the "I" is an emergent response to the generalized other; and the "me" is that phase of the self that represents the social situation within which the individual must operate. Thus, the critical capacity of the self takes form in the "I" and has two dimensions: (1) explicit self- criticism (aimed at the "me") is implicit social criticism; and (2) explicit social criticism is implicit self- criticism. For example, the criticism of one's own moral principles is also the criticism of the morality of one's social world, for personal morality is rooted in social morality. Conversely, the criticism of the morality of one's society raises questions concerning one's own moral role in the social situation.

Since self and society are dialectical poles of a single process, change in one pole will result in change in the other pole. It would appear that social reconstructions are effected by individuals (or groups of individuals) who find themselves in conflict with a given society; and once the reconstruction is accomplished, the new social situation generates far-reaching changes in the personality structures of the individuals involved in that situation." In short," writes Mead, "social reconstruction and self or personality reconstruction are the two sides of a single process — the process of human social evolution" (Mind, Self and Society 309).

4. The Temporal Structure of Human Existence

The temporal structure of human existence, according to Mead, can be described in terms of the concepts of emergence, sociality, and freedom.

Emergence and Temporality

What is the ground of the temporality of human experience? Temporal structure, according to Mead, arises with the appearance of novel or "emergent" events in experience. The emergent event is an unexpected disruption of continuity, an inhibition of passage. The emergent, in other words, constitutes a problem for human action, a problem to be overcome. The emergent event, which arises in a present, establishes a barrier between present and future; emergence is an inhibition of (individual and collective) conduct, a disharmony that projects experience into a distant future in which harmony may be re-instituted. The initial temporal structure of human time-consciousness lies in the separation of present and future by the emergent event. The actor, blocked in his activity, confronts the emergent problem in his present and looks to the future as the field of potential resolution of conflict. The future is a temporally, and frequently spatially, distant realm to be reached through intelligent action. Human action is action-in-time.

Mead argues out that, without inhibition of activity and without the distance created by the inhibition, there can be no experience of time. Further, Mead believes that, without the rupture of continuity, there can be no experience at all. Experience presupposes change as well as permanence. Without disruption, "there would be merely the passage of events" (The Philosophy of the Act 346), and mere passage does not constitute change. Passage is pure continuity without interruption (a phenomenon of which humans, with the possible exception of a few mystics, have precious little experience). Change arises with a departure from continuity. Change does not, however, involve the total obliteration of continuity — there must be a "persisting non-passing content" against which an emergent event is experienced as a change (The Philosophy of the Act 330-331).

Experience begins with the problematic. Continuity itself cannot be experienced unless it is broken; that is, continuity is not an object of awareness unless it becomes problematic, and continuity becomes problematic as a result of the emergence of discontinuous events. Hence, continuity and discontinuity (emergence) are not contradictories, but dialectical polarities (mutually dependent levels of reality) that generate experience itself. "The now is contrasted with a then and implies that a background which is irrelevant to the difference between them has been secured within which the now and the then may appear. There must be banks within which the stream of time may flow" (The Philosophy of the Act 161).

Emergence, then, is a fundamental condition of experience, and the experience of the emergent is the experience of temporality. Emergence sunders present and future and is thereby an occasion for action. Action, moreover, occurs in time; the human act is infected with time — it aims at the future. Human action is teleological. Discontinuity, therefore, and not continuity (in the sense of mere duration or passage), is the foundation of time-experience (and of experience itself). The emergent event constitutes time, i.e., creates the necessity of time.

The Function of the Past in Human Experience

The emergent event is not only a problem for ongoing activity: it also constitutes a problem for rationality. Reason, according to Mead, is the search for causal continuity in experience and, in fact, must presuppose such continuity in its attempt to construct a coherent account of reality. Reason must assume that all natural events can be reduced to conditions that make the events possible. But the emergent event presents itself as discontinuous, as a disruption without conditions.

It is by means of the reconstruction of the past that the discontinuous event becomes continuous in experience: "The character of the past is that it connects what is unconnected in the merging of one present into another" ("The Nature of the Past" [1929], in Selected Writings 351). The emergent event, when placed within a reconstructed past, is a determined event; but since this past was reconstructed from the perspective of the emergent event, the emergent event is also a determining event (The Philosophy of the Present 15). The emergent event itself indicates the continuities within which the event may be viewed as continuous. There is, then, no question of predicting the emergent, for it is, by definition and also experientially, unpredictable; but once the emergent appears in experience, it may be placed within a continuity dictated by its own character. Determination of the emergent is retrospective determination.

Mead's conception of time entails a drastic revision of the idea of the irrevocability of the past. The past is "both irrevocable and revocable" (The Philosophy of the Present 2). There is no sense in the idea of an independent or "real" past, for the past is always formulated in the light of the emerging present. It is necessary to continually reformulate the past from the point of view of the newly emergent situation. For example, the movement for the liberation of African-Americans has led to the discovery of the American black's cultural past. "Black (or African-American) History" is, in effect, a function of the emergence of the civil rights movement in the late 1940s and early 1950s and the subsequent development of that movement. As far as most Americans were hitherto concerned, there simply was no history of the American black — there was only a history of white Europeans, which included the history of slavery in America.

There can be no finality in historical accounts. The past is irrevocable in the sense that something has happened; but what has happened (that is, the essence of the past) is always open to question and reinterpretation. Further, the irrevocability of the past "is found in the extension of the necessity with which what has just happened conditions what is emerging in the future" (The Philosophy of the Present 3). Irrevocability is a characteristic of the past only in relation to the demands of a present looking into the future. That is to say that even the sense that something has happened arises out of a situation in which an emergent event has appeared as a problem.

Like Edmund Husserl, Mead conceives of human consciousness as intentional in its structure and orientation: the world of conscious experience is "intended," "meant," "constituted," "constructed" by consciousness. Thus, objectivity can have meaning only within the domain of the subject, the realm of consciousness. It is not that the existence of the objective world is constituted by consciousness, but that the meaning of that world is so constituted. In Husserlian language, the existence of the objective world is transcendent, i.e., independent of consciousness; but the meaning of the objective world is immanent, i.e., dependent on consciousness. In Mead's "phenomenology" of historical experience, then, the past may be said to possess an objective existence, but the meaning of the past is constituted or constructed according to the intentional concerns of historical thought. The meaning of the past ("what has happened") is defined by an historical consciousness that is rooted in a present and that is opening upon a newly emergent future.

History is founded on human action in response to emergent events. Action is an attempt to adjust to changes that emerge in experience; the telos of the act is the re-establishment of a sundered continuity. Since the past is instrumental in the re-establishment of continuity, the adjustment to the emergent requires the creation of history. "By looking into the future," Mead observes, "society acquired a history" (The Philosophy of the Act 494). And the future- orientation of history entails that every new discovery, every new project, will alter our picture of the past.

Although Mead discounts the possibility of a transcendent past (that is, a past independent of any present), he does not deny the possibility of validity in historical accounts. An historical account will be valid or correct, not absolutely, but in relation to a specific emergent context. Accounts of the past "become valid in interpreting [the world] in so far as they present a history of becoming in [the world] leading up to that which is becoming today . . . . " (The Philosophy of the Present 9). Historical thought is valid in so far as it renders change intelligible and permits the continuation of activity. An appeal to an absolutely correct account of the past is not only impossible, but also irrelevant to the actual conduct of historical inquiry. A meaningful past is a usable past.

Historians are, to be sure, concerned with the truth of historical accounts, i.e., with the "objectivity" of the past. The historical conscience seeks to reconstruct the past on the basis of evidence and to present an accurate interpretation of the data of history. Mead's point is that all such reconstructions and interpretations of the past are grounded in a present that is opening into a future and that the time-conditioned nature and interests of historical thought made the construction of a purely "objective" historical account impossible. Historical consciousness is "subjective" in the sense that it aims at an interpretation of the past that will be humanly meaningful in the present and in the foreseeable future. Thus, for Mead, historical inquiry is the imaginative-but-honest, intelligent-and-intelligible reconstruction and interpretation of the human past on the basis of all available and relevant evidence. Above all, the historian seeks to define the meaning of the human past and, in that way, to make a contribution to humanity's search for an overall understanding of human existence.

Sociality and Time

The emergent event, then, is basic to Mead's theory of time. The emergent event is a becoming, an unexpected occurrence "which in its relation to other events gives structure to time" (The Philosophy of the Present 21). But what is the ontological status of emergence? What is its relation to the general structure of reality? The possibility of emergence is grounded in Mead's conception of the relatedness, the "sociality," of natural processes.

Mead's philosophy arises from a fundamental ecological vision of the world, a vision of the world containing a multiplicity of related systems (e.g., the bee system and the flower system, which together form the bee-flower system). Nature is a system of systems or relationships; it is not a collection of particles or fragments which are actually separate. Distinctions, for Mead, are abstractions within fields of activity; and all natural objects (animate or inanimate) exist within systems apart from which the existence of the objects themselves is unthinkable.

The sense of the organic body arises with reference to "external" objects; and these external objects in turn derive their character from their relation to an organic individual. The body-object and the physical object arise with reference to each other, and it is this relationship, in Mead's view, that constitutes the reality of each referent. "It is over against the surfaces of other things that the outside of the organism arises in experience, and then the experiences of the organism which are not in such contacts become the inside of the organism. It is a process in which the organism is bounded, and other things are bounded as well" (The Philosophy of the Act 160). Similarly, the resistance of the object to organic pressure is, in effect, the activity of the object; and this activity becomes the "inside" of the object. The inside of the object, moreover, is not a projection from the organism, but is there in the relation between the organism and thing (see The Philosophy of the Present 122-124, 131, 136). The relation between organism and object, then, is a social relation (The Philosophy of the Act 109-110).

Thus, the relation between a natural object (or event) and the system within which it exists is not unidirectional. The character of the object, on the one hand, is determined by its membership in a system; but, on the other hand, the character of the system is determined by the activity of the object (or event). There is a mutual determination of object and system, organism and environment, percipient event and consentient set (The Philosophy of the Act 330).

While this mutuality of individual and system is characteristic of all natural processes, Mead is particularly concerned with the biological realm and lays great emphasis on the interdependence and interaction of organism and environment. Whereas the environment provides the conditions within which the acts of the organism emerge as possibilities, it is the activity of the organism that transforms the character of the environment. Thus, "an animal with the power of digesting and assimilating what could not before be digested and assimilated is the condition for the appearance of food in his environment" (The Philosophy of the Act 334). In this respect, "what the individual is determines what the character of his environment will be" (The Philosophy of the Act 338).

The relation of organism and environment is not static, but dynamic. The activities of the environment alter the organism, and the activities of the organism alter the environment. The organism-environment relation is, moreover, complex rather than simple. The environment of any organism contains a multiplicity of processes, perspectives, systems, any one of which may become a factor in the organism's field of activity. The ability of the organism to act with reference to a multiplicity of situations is an example of the sociality of natural events. And it is by virtue of this sociality, this "capacity of being several things at once" (The Philosophy of the Present 49), that the organism is able to encounter novel occurrences.

By moving from one system to another, the organism confronts unfamiliar and unexpected situations which, because of their novelty, constitute problems of adjustment for the organism. These emergent situations are possible given the multiplicity of natural processes and given the ability of natural events (e.g., organisms) to occupy several systems at once. A bee, for example, is capable of relating to other bees, to flowers, to bears, to little boys, albeit with various attitudes. But sociality is not restricted to animate events. A mountain may be simultaneously an aspect of geography, part of a landscape, an object of religious veneration, the dialectical pole of a valley, and so forth. The capacity of sociality is a universal character of nature.

There are, then, two modes of sociality: (1) Sociality characterizes the "process of readjustment" by which an organism incorporates an emergent event into its ongoing experience. This sociality in passage, which is "given in immediate relation of the past and present," constitutes the temporal mode of sociality (The Philosophy of the Present 51). (2) A natural event is social, not only by virtue of its dynamic relationship with newly emergent situations, but also by virtue of its simultaneous membership in different systems at any given instant. In any given present, "the location of the object in one system places it in the others as well" (The Philosophy of the Present 63). The object is social, not merely in terms of its temporal relations, but also in terms of its relations with other objects in an instantaneous field. This mode of sociality constitutes the emergent event; that is, the state of a system at a given instant is the social reality within which emergent events occur, and it is this reality that must be adjusted to the exigencies of time. Thus, the principle of sociality is the ontological foundation of Mead's concept of emergence: sociality is the ground of the possibility of emergence as well as the basis on which emergent events are incorporated into the structure of ongoing experience.

Temporality and the Problem of Freedom

When Mead's theory of the self is placed in the context of his description of the temporality of human existence, it is possible to construct an account, not only of the reality of human freedom, but also of the conditions that give rise to the experience of loss of freedom.

Mead grounds his analysis of human consciousness in the social process of communication and, on that foundation, makes "the other" an integral part of self- understanding. The world in which the self lives, then, is an inter- subjective and interactive world — a "populated world" containing, not only the individual self, but also other persons. Intersubjectivity is to be explained in terms of that "meeting of minds" which occurs in conversation, learning, reading, and thinking (The Philosophy of the Act 52-53). It is on the basis of such socio-symbolic interactions between individuals, and by means of the conceptual symbols of the communicational process, that the mind and the self come into existence.

The human world is also temporally structured, and the temporality of experience, Mead argues, is a flow that is primarily present. The past is part of my experience now, and the projected future is also part of my experience now. There is hardly a moment when, turning to the temporality of my life, I do not find myself existing in the now. Thus, it would appear that whatever is for me, is now; and, needless to say, whatever is of importance or whatever is meaningful for me, is of importance or is meaningful now. This is true even if that which is important and meaningful for me is located in the "past" or in the "future." Existential time is time lived in the now. My existence is rooted in a "living present," and it is within this "living present" that my life unfolds and discloses itself. Thus, to gain full contact with oneself, it is necessary to focus one's consciousness on the present and to appropriate that present (that "existential situation") as one's own.

This "philosophy of the present" need not lead to a careless, "live only for today" attitude. Our past is always with us (in the form of memory, history, tradition, etc.), and it provides a context for the "living present." We live "in the present," but also "out of the past;" and to live well now, we cannot afford to "forget" the past. A fully meaningful human existence must be "lived now," but with continual reference to the past: we must continue to affirm "that which has been good," and we must work to eliminate or to avoid "that which has been bad." Moreover, a full human existence must be lived, not only in-the-present-out-of-the-past, but also in- the-present-toward-the-future. The human present opens toward the future. "Today" must always be lived with a concern for "tomorrow," for we are continually moving toward the future, whether we like it or not. Further, we are "called" into this future, toward ever new possibilities; and we must, if we wish to live well, develop a "right mindfulness" which orients our present- centered consciousness toward the possibilities and challenges of the impending future. But we must "live now" with reference to both past and future.

The self, as we have seen, is characterized in part by its activity (the "I") in response to its world, and how the individual is active with respect to his world is through his choices and his awareness of his choices. The individual experiences himself as having choices, or as being confronted with situations which require choices on his part. He does not (ordinarily) experience himself as being controlled by the world. The world presents obstacles to him, and yet he experiences himself as being able to respond to these obstacles in a variety (even though a finite variety) of ways.

One loses one's freedom, even one's selfhood, when one is unaware of one's choices or when one refuses to face the fact that one has choices. From the standpoint of Mead's description of the temporality of action and his emphasis on the importance of problematic situations in human experience, emergencies or "crises" in one's life are of the utmost existential significance. I am a being that exists in relation to a world. As such, it is essential that I experience myself as "in harmony with" the world; and if this proves difficult or impossible, then I am thrown into a "crisis," i.e., I am threatened with separation (Greek, krisis) from the world; and separation from the world, from the standpoint of a being- in-the-world, is tantamount to non- being. It is in this context that the loss of one's freedom, the experience of lost autonomy, becomes a real possibility. Encountering a crisis in the process of life, the individual may well experience himself as paralyzed, as "stuck" in his situation, as patient rather than as agent of change. But it is also the case that the experience of crisis may lead to a deepened sense of one's active involvement in the temporal unfolding of life. From Mead's point of view, a crisis is a "crucial time" or a turning-point in individual existence: negatively, it is a threat to the individual's continuity in and with his world; positively, it is an opportunity to redefine, broaden, and deepen the individual's sense of self and of the world to which the self is ontologically related.

Thus, it would appear that crises may in fact undermine the sense of freedom of choice; and yet, it is also true that crises constitute opportunities for the exercise of freedom since such "breaks" or discontinuities in our experience demand that we make decisions as to what we are "going to do now." In this way, break-downs might be viewed as break-throughs. Freedom denied on one level of experience is rediscovered at another. One must lose oneself in order to find oneself.

5. Perception and Reflection: Mead's Theory of Perspectives

Mead's concept of sociality, as we have seen, implies a vision of reality as situational, or perspectival. A perspective is "the world in its relationship to the individual and the individual in his relationship to the world" (The Philosophy of the Act 115). A perspective, then, is a situation in which a percipient event (or individual) exists with reference to a consentient set (or environment) and in which a consentient set exists with reference to a percipient event. There are, obviously, many such situations (or perspectives). These are not, in Mead's view, imperfect representations of "an absolute reality" that transcends all particular situations. On the contrary, "these situations are the reality" which is the world (The Philosophy of the Act 215).

Distance Experience

For Mead, perceptual objects arise within the act and are instrumental in the consummation of the act. At the perceptual stage of the act, these objects are distant from the perceiving individual: they are "over there;" they are "not here" and "not now." The distance is both spatial and temporal. Such objects invite the perceiving individual to act with reference to them, to "make contact" with them. Thus, Mead speaks of perceptual objects as "plans of action" that "control" the "action of the individual" (The Philosophy of the Present 176 and The Philosophy of the Act 262). Distance experience implies contact experience. Perception leads on to manipulation.

The readiness of the individual to make contact with distant objects is what Mead calls a "terminal attitude." Terminal attitudes "are beginnings of the contact response that will be made to the object when the object is reached" (The Philosophy of the Act 161). Such attitudes "are those which, if carried out into overt action, would lead to movements which, if persevered in, would overcome the distances and bring the objects into the manipulatory sphere" (The Philosophy of the Act 171). A terminal attitude, then, is an implicit manipulation of a distant object; it stands at the beginning of the act and is an intellectual-and-emotional posture in terms of which the individual encounters the world. As present in the beginning of the act, the terminal attitude contains the later stages of the act in the sense that perception implies manipulation and in the sense that manipulation is aimed at the resolution of a problem. In terminal attitudes, all stages of the act interpenetrate.

Within the act, then, there is a tendency on the part of the perceiving individual to approach distant objects in terms of the "values of the manipulatory sphere." Distant objects are perceived "with the dimensions they would have if they were brought within the field in which we could both handle and see them" (The Philosophy of the Act 170-171). For example, a distant shape is seen as being palpable, as having a certain size and weight, as having such and such a texture, and so forth. In perception, the manipulatory area is extended, and the distant object becomes hypothetically a contact object.

In immediate perceptual experience, the distant object is in the future. Contact with the distant object is implicit, i.e., anticipated. "The percept," according to Mead, "is there as a promise" (The Philosophy of the Act 103). In so far as the act of perception involves terminal attitudes, the promise (or futurity) of the distant object is "collapsed" into a hypothetical "now" in which the perceiving individual and the perceptual object exist simultaneously. The temporal distance between individual and object is thus suspended; this suspension of time permits alternative (and perhaps conflicting) contact reactions to the object to be "tested" in imagination. Thus, the act may be "completed" in abstraction before it is completed in fact. In this sense, "the percept is a collapsed act" (The Philosophy of the Act 128).

The contemporaneity of individual and distant object is an abstraction within the act. In the collapsed act, time is abstracted from space "for the purposes of our conduct" (The Philosophy of the Present 177). Prior to actual manipulation, the perceiving individual anticipates a variety of ways in which a given object might be manipulated. This implicit testing of alternative responses to the distant object is the essence of reflective conduct. The actual futurity of the distant object is suspended, and the object is treated as though it were present in the manipulatory area. The time of the collapsed act, therefore, is an abstracted time that involves "the experience of inhibited action in which the goal is present as achieved through the individual assuming the attitude of contact response, and thus leaving the events that should elapse between the beginning and the end of the act present only in their abstracted character as passing" (The Philosophy of the Act 232).

Thus, in the abstracted time of the collapsed act, "certain objects cease to be events, cease to pass as they are in reality passing and in their permanence become the conditions of our action, and events take place with reference to them" (The Philosophy of the Present 177). The perceiving individual's terminal attitudes constitute an anticipatory contact experience in which the futurity of distant objects is reduced to an abstract contemporaneity. This reduction of futurity, we have seen, is instrumental in the reflective conduct of the acting individual.

In perception, then, distant objects are reduced to the manipulatory area and become (hypothetically) contact objects. "The fundamentals of perception are the spatio-temporal distances of objects lying outside the manipulatory area and the readiness of the organism to act toward them as they will be if they come within the manipulatory area" (The Philosophy of the Act 104). Perception involves the assumption of contact qualities in the distant object. The object is removed from its actual temporal position and is incorporated in a "permanent" space which is actually the space "of the manipulatory area, hypothetically extended" (The Philosophy of the Act 185). The object, which is actually spatio-temporally distant, becomes, hypothetically and for the purposes of reflective conduct, spatio-temporally present: it is, in the perceiving individual's assumption of the contact attitude, both "here" and "now."

Perspectives

Early modern accounts of perception, in an attempt to ground the theories and methods of modern science in a philosophical framework, made a distinction between the "primary" and "secondary" qualities of objects. Galileo articulated the latter distinction as follows:

I feel myself impelled by the necessity, as soon as I conceive a piece of matter or corporeal substance, of conceiving that in its own nature it is bounded and figured in such and such a figure, that in relation to others it is either large or small, that it is in this or that place, in this or that time, that it is in motion or remains at rest . . . , that it is single, few or many; in short by no imagination can a body be separated from such conditions: but that it must be white or red, bitter or sweet, sounding or mute, of a pleasant or unpleasant odour, I do not perceive my mind forced to acknowledge it necessarily accompanied by such conditions; so if the senses are not the escorts, perhaps the reason or the imagination by itself would never have arrived at them. Hence I think that these tastes, odours, colors, etc., on the side of the object in which they seem to exist, are nothing but mere names, but hold their residence solely in the sensitive body; so that if the animal were removed, every such quality would be abolished and annihilated (quoted by E.A. Burtt, The Metaphysical Foundations of Modern Physical Science [Doubleday, 1932], 85-86).

Another way of putting this is to say that the primary qualities of an object are those which are subject to precise mathematical calculation, whereas the secondary qualities of the object are those which are rooted in the sensibility of the perceiving organism and which are therefore not "objectively" quantifiable. The primary qualities (number, position, extension, bulk, and so forth) are there in the object, but the secondary qualities are subjective reactions to the object on the part of the sensitive organism. A corollary of this doctrine is that the primary qualities, because they are objective, are more "knowable" than are the subjective secondary qualities.

A serious breakdown in the theory of primary and secondary qualities appeared in the critical epistemology of George Berkeley. According to Berkeley, whatever we know of objects, we know on the basis of perception. The primary as well as the secondary qualities of objects are apprehended in sensation. Moreover, primary qualities are never perceived except in conjunction with secondary qualities. Both primary and secondary qualities, therefore, are derived from perception and are ideas "in the mind." When we "know" the primary qualities of an object, what we "know" are "our own ideas and sensations." Thus, Berkeley calls into question the "objectivity" of the primary qualities; these qualities, it would appear, are as dependent upon a perceiving organism as are secondary qualities. The outcome of Berkeley's radical subjectivism (which reaches its apogee in the skepticism of Hume) is an epistemological crisis in which the "knowability" of the external world is rendered problematic.

Mead's account of distance experience offers a description of the experiential basis of the separation of primary and secondary qualities. In the exigencies of action, we have seen, there is a tendency on the part of the acting individual to reduce distant objects to the contact area. "It is this collapsing of the act," according to Mead, "which is responsible for the so- called subjective nature of the secondary qualities . . . [of] objects" (The Philosophy of the Act 121). The contact characters of the object become the main focus within the act, while the distance characters are bracketed out (that is, held in suspension or ignored for the time being). For the purposes of conduct, "the reality of what we see is what we can handle" (The Philosophy of the Act 105). In Mead's analysis of perception, the distinction between distance and contact characters is roughly equivalent to the traditional distinction between secondary and primary qualities, respectively. For Mead, however, the distance characters of an object are not "subjective," but are as objective as the contact characters. Distance characters (such as color, sound, odor, and taste) are there in the act; they appear in the transition from impulse to perception and are present even in manipulation: "In the manipulatory area one actually handles the colored, odorous, sounding, sapid object. The distance characters seem to be no longer distant, and the object answers to a collapsed act" (The Philosophy of the Act 121).

Mead's theory of perspectives is, in effect, an attempt to make clear the objective intentionality of perceptual experience. In Mead's relational conception of biological existence, there is a mutual determination of organism and environment; the character of the organism determines the environment, just as the character of the environment determines the organism.

In his opposition to outright environmental determinism, Mead points out that the sensitivity, selectivity, and organizational capacities of organisms are sources of the control of the environment by the form. On the human level, for example, we find the phenomenon of attention. The human being selects her stimuli and thereby organizes the field within which she acts. Attention, then, is characterized by its selectivity and organizing tendency. "Here we have the organism as acting and deter mining its environment. It is not simply a set of passive senses played upon by the stimuli that come from without. The organism goes out and determines what it is going to respond to, and organizes the world" (Mind, Self and Society 25). Attention is the foundation of human intelligence; it is the capacity of attention that gives us control over our experience and conduct. Attention is one of the elements of human freedom.

The relation between organism and environment is, in a word, interactive. The perceptual object arises within this interactive matrix and is "determined by its reference to some percipient event, or individual, in a consentient set" (The Philosophy of the Act 166). In other words, perceptual objects are perspectively determined, and perspectives are determined by perceiving individuals.

Even when we consider only sense data, the object is clearly a function of the whole situation whose perspective is determined by the individual. There are peculiarities in the objects which depend upon the individual as an organism and the spatio-temporal position of the individual. It is one of the important results of the modern doctrine of relativity that we are forced to recognize that we cannot account for these peculiarities by stating the individual in terms of his environment. (The Philosophy of the Act 224).

The perceiving individual cannot be explained in terms of the so-called external world, since that individual is a necessary condition of the appearance of that world.

Mead thus abandons, on the basis of his interpretation of relativity theory, the object of Newtonian physics. But in addition to denying the concrete existence of independent objects, he also denies the existence of the independent psyche. There is nothing subjective about perceptual experience. If objects exist with reference to the perceiving individual, it is also true that the perceiving individual exists with reference to objects. The qualities of objects (distance as well as contact qualities) exist in the relation between the perceiving individual and the world. The so-called secondary sensuous qualities, therefore, are objectively present in the individual-world matrix; sensuous characters are there in a given perspective on reality.

In actual perceptual experience, the object is objectively present in relation to the individual. Whereas the relation between the world and the perceiving individual led Berkeley to a radical subjectification of experience, Mead's relationism leads him to an equally radical objectification of experience.

Perspectives, in Mead's view, are objectively real. Perspectives are "there in nature," and natural reality is the overall "organization of perspectives." There is, so far as we can directly know, no natural reality beyond the organization of perspectives, no noumena, no independent "world of physical particles in absolute space and time" (The Philosophy of the Present 163). The cosmos is nature stratified into a multiplicity of perspectives, all of which are interrelated. Perspectival stratifications of nature "are not only there in nature but they are the only forms of nature that are there" (The Philosophy of the Present 171).

The Scientific Object

Mead distinguishes two main types of perspective: (1) the perceptual perspective and (2) the reflective perspective. A perceptual perspective is rooted in the space-time world in which action is unreflective. This is the world of immediate perceptual experience. A reflective perspective is a response to the world of perceptual perspectives. The perspectives of fig trees and wasps are, from the standpoint of the trees and wasps (hypothetically considered), perceptually independent, except for certain points of intersection (that is, actual contacts). "But in the reflective perspective of the man who plants the fig trees and insures the presence of the wasps, both life-histories run their courses, and their intersection provides a dimension from which their interconnection maintains their species" (The Philosophy of the Act 185). Reflectively, the fig tree perspective and the wasp perspective form a single perspective "that includes the perspectives of both" (The Philosophy of the Act 184). The world of reflective perspectives is the world of reflective thought and action, the world of distance experience and the world of scientific inquiry. It is within the reflective perspective that the hypothetical objects of the collapsed act arise. Since Mead's conception of distance experience has been discussed earlier, the present analysis will concentrate on the emergence of the scientific object in reflective experience.

Corresponding to the two types of perspective outlined above are two attitudes toward the perceptual objects which arise in experience. There is, first, and corresponding to the perceptual perspective, "the attitude of immediate experience," which is grounded in "the world that is there" (The Philosophy of the Act 14). The world that is there (a phrase Mead uses over and over again) includes our own acts, our own bodies, and our own psychological responses to the things that emerge in our ongoing activity. Perceptual objects, in the world that is there, are what they appear to be in their relation to the perceiving individual.

The second attitude toward perceptual objects is that of "reflective analysis," which attempts to set forth the preconditions of perceptual experience. This attitude corresponds to the reflective perspective. It is through reflective analysis of perceptual objects that scientific objects are constructed. Examples of scientific objects are the Newtonian notions of absolute space and absolute time, the concept of the world at an instant (absolute simultaneity), the notion of "ultimate elements" (atoms, electrons, particles), and so on. Such objects, according to Mead, are hypothetical abstractions which arise in the scientific attempt to explain the world of immediate experience. "The whole tendency of the natural sciences, as exhibited especially in physics and chemistry, is to replace the objects of immediate experience by hypothetical objects which lie beyond the range of possible experience" (The Philosophy of the Act 291). Scientific objects are not objects of experience. Science accounts for the perceptible in terms of the non- perceptible (and often the imperceptible).

There is a danger in the reflective analysis of the world that is there, namely, the reification of scientific objects and the subjectification of perceptual objects. That is, it is possible to conceive of the perceptual world as a product of organic sensitivity (including human consciousness) while the world of scientific objects is "conceived of as entirely independent of perceiving individuals" (The Philosophy of the Act 284- 285). According to Mead, this formulation of the relation between scientific objects and perceptual objects is "entirely uncritical" (The Philosophy of the Act 19). The alleged separation of scientific and perceptual objects leads to a "bifurcated nature" in which experience is cut off from reality through the dualism of primary and secondary qualities. Mead's critique of the latter doctrine, discussed above, reveals that "the organism is a part of the physical world we are explaining" (The Philosophy of the Act 21). and that the perceptual object, with all of its qualities, is objectively there in the relation between organism and world. The scientific object, moreover, has ultimate reference to the perceptual world. The act of reflective analysis within which the scientific object arises presupposes the world that is there in perceptual experience. Scientific objects are abstractions within the reflective act and are, in effect, attempts to account for the objects of perceptual experience. And it is to the world that is there that the scientist must go to confirm or disconfirm the hypothetical objects of scientific theory.

Reflective analysis thus arises within and presupposes an unreflective world of immediate experience. And it is this immediate world "which is the final test of the reality of scientific hypotheses as well as the test of the truth of all our ideas and suppositions" (Mind, Self and Society 352). In Mind, Self and Society, Mead refers to the unreflective world as the world of the "biologic individual." "The term," he points out,

refers to the individual in an attitude and at a moment in which the impulses sustain an unfractured relation with the objects around him . . . . I have termed it "biologic" because the term lays emphasis on the living reality which may be distinguished from reflection. A later reflection turns back upon it and endeavors to present the complete interrelationship between the world and the individual in terms of physical stimuli and biological mechanisms [scientific objects]; the actual experience did not take place in this [hypothetical] form but in the form of unsophisticated reality (Mind, Self and Society 352, 353, emphasis added).

The world that is there is prior to the reflective world of scientific theory. The reification of scientific objects at the expense of perceptual experience is, in Mead's view, the product of an "uncritical scientific imagination" (The Philosophy of the Act 21).

Mead's analysis of the scientific object is an attempt to establish the actual relation between reflective analysis and perceptual experience. His aim is to demonstrate the objective reality of the perceptual world. He does not, however, deny the reality of scientific objects. Scientific objects are hypothetical objects which are real in so far as they render the experiential world intelligible and controllable. Harold N. Lee, in discussing Mead's philosophy, points out that "the task of science is to understand the world we live in and to enable us to act intelligently within it; it is not to construct a new and artificial world except in so far as the artificial picture aids in understanding and controlling the world we live in. The artificial picture is not be substituted for the world" (Lee 56, emphasis added). Scientific knowledge is not final, but hypothetical; and the reality of scientific objects is, therefore, hypothetical rather than absolute.

Reflective conduct takes place with reference to problems that emerge in the world that is there, and the construction of scientific objects is aimed at solving these problems. Problematic situations occur within the world that is there; it is not the entire world of experience that becomes problematic, but only aspects of that world. And while the scientific attitude is "ready to question everything," it does not "question everything at once" (Selected Writings 200). "The scientist," according to Mead, "always deals with an actual problem;" he does not question "the whole world of meaning," but only that part of the world which has come into conflict with accepted doctrine. The unquestioned aspects of the world "form the necessary field without which no conflict can arise." "The possible calling in question of any content, whatever it may be, means always that there is left a field of unquestioned reality" (Selected Writings 205). It is to this field of unquestioned reality that the scientist returns to test his reconstructed theory. "The world of the scientist is always there as one in which reconstruction is taking place with continual shifting of problems, but as a real world within which the problems arise" (Selected Writings 206, emphasis added).

6. Philosophy of History

a. The Nature of History

History, according to Mead, is the collective time of the social act. Historical thought arises in response to emergent events (crises, new situations, unexpected disruptions) that are confronted in community life. Mead's general description of experiential time holds with reference to the time of historical experience: the continuity of experience is rendered problematic by the emergent event; present and future are cut off from each other, and the past (both in terms of its content and of its meaning) is called into question; the past is reconstructed in such a way that the emergent event is seen as continuous with the past. In this manner, the present difficulty becomes intelligible, and the emergent discontinuity of experience is potentially resolvable. Historical thought is a reconstruction of a communal past in an attempt to understand the nature and significance of a communal present and a (potential) communal future. Historical accounts are never final since historical thought continually restates the past in terms of newly emergent situations in a present that opens upon a future.

Human life is an ongoing process that is temporally structured. The existential present, the "now" within which we act, is dynamic and implies a past and a future. The notion of the world at an instant (the knife-edge present) is, according to Mead, an abstraction within the act which may be instrumental in the pursuit of consummation; but as a description of concrete experience, the knife-edge present is a specious present. The specious present is not the actual present of ongoing experience. The present, in Mead's words, "is something that is happening, going on" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 300). "Our experience is always a passing experience, and . . . this passing experience always involves an extension into other experiences. It is what has just happened, what is going on, what is just appearing in the future, that gives to our experience its peculiar character. It is never an experience just at an instant. There is no such thing as the experience of a bare instant as such" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 299). Human experience is fundamentally dynamic, and human life is built on a temporal foundation.

The emergent event is the foundation of novelty in experience. This novelty is characteristic, not only of the present, but also of the past and future. The future, on the one hand, lies beyond the emergent present; and the novelty of the future takes the form of the unexpected. The emergent event creates a future that comes to us as a surprise. The past, on the other hand, must be reinterpreted in the light of the emergent event; the result of such reinterpretation is nothing less than a new past. Consciousness of the past develops in response to emergent events that alter our sense of temporal relationships.

We find that each generation has a different history, that it is a part of the apparatus of each generation to reconstruct its history. A different Caesar crosses the Rubicon not only with each author but with each generation. That is, as we look back over the past, it is a different past. The experience is something like that of a person climbing a mountain. As he looks back over the terrain he has covered, it presents a continually different picture. So the past is continually changing as we look at it from the point of view of different authors, different generations. It is not simply the future [and present] which is novel, then; the past is also novel (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 116-117).

History is the reconstruction of the past in response to a new present that opens toward a new future. This emphasis on the novelty of human experience pervades Mead's thought. Science, according to Mead, thrives on novelty. Scientific inquiry is, in essence, a response to exceptions to laws. While science, on the one hand, defines knowledge as "finding uniformities, finding rules, laws" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 270), it also, on the other hand, seeks to upset all uniformities, rules, and laws through the quest for novelty. Scientific inquiry arises out of the conflict between what was expected to happen and what actually happens; contradictions in experience are the starting- points for the scientific reconstruction of knowledge (Mead, Selected Writings 188).

Science, for Mead, is a continual reconstruction of our conception of the world in response to novel situations. Mead's slogan for science is, "The law is dead; long live the law!" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 286). Science is a form of human existence, a way of moving with the changes that emerge before us. Science is essentially "a method, a way of understanding the world" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 288).

History is the science of the human past. Historical inquiry presents the past "on the basis of actual documents and their interpretation in terms of historical criticism" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 448). But the historical past, as we have seen, is not independent of present and future. Historical inquiry, like scientific inquiry in general, takes place in a present that has become problematic through the occurrence of an emergent event. An ancient village is unearthed in Asia Minor, and the rise of human civilization is suddenly pushed back five thousand years in time; the demand on the part of African-Americans for liberty and identity leads to a revaluation of black culture in terms of its historical roots.

In Mead's conception of historical method, the past is in the present and becomes meaningful in the present. As Tonness has suggested, the past is not "a metaphysical reality accessible to present activity," but an "epistemological reference system" which gives coherence to the emerging present (606). Historical thought reconstructs the past continually in an attempt to reveal the cognitive significance of present and future.

It is not only the content of the past that is subject to change. Past events have meanings that are also changed as novel events emerge in ongoing experience. The meaning of past events is determined by the relation of those events to a present. The elucidation of such meaning is the task of historical thought and inquiry. An historical account, as we have seen, is true to the extent that the present is rendered coherent by reference to past events. Historical thought reinterprets the past in terms of the present. But this reinterpretation is not capricious. The historical past arises in the reexamination and representation of evidence. Historical accounts must be documented. No historical account, however, is final. The meaning of the past is always open to question; any given interpretation of the past may be criticized from the standpoint of a different interpretation.

Historical truth, in Mead's view, is relative truth. The meaning of the past changes as present slides into present (The Philosophy of the Present 9) and as different individuals and groups are confronted with new situations that demand a temporal reintegration of experience. A new present suggests a new future and demands a new past. This interdependence of past, present, and future is the essential character of human temporality and of historical consciousness.

b. History and Self-Consciousness

In Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century, Mead offers the Romantic movement of the late 18th and 19th centuries as an example of the present and future orientation of human inquiries into the past. Mead's description of the Romantics' reconstruction of self-consciousness on the basis of a reconstructed past is a concrete illustration of his conception of historical consciousness as developing with reference to a problematic present. The Romantic historians and philosophers, confronted with the disruption of experience, which was the result of the early modern revolutionary period, turned to the medieval past in an effort to redefine the historical and cultural identity of European man. The major characteristic of Romantic thought, according to Mead, was an attempt to redefine European self- consciousness through the re-appropriation of the historical past. "It was the essence of the Romantic movement to return to the past from the point of view of the self-consciousness of the Romantic period, to become aware of itself in terms of the past" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 447- 448). The European had been cut off from his past by the political and cultural revolutions of the 16th, 17th, and 18th centuries; and in the post-revolutionary world of the early 19th century, the Romantic movement represented the European quest for a reconstructed identity. It was history that provided the basis for this reconstruction.

The Revolt of Reason Against Authority

The idea of rationality has played a central role in modern social theory. The revolt against arbitrary authority "came on the basis of a description of human nature as having in it a rational principle from which authority could proceed" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 12). Thus, the aim of modern social theory has been to root social institutions in human nature rather than in divine providence. The doctrine of the rights of man and the idea of the social contract, for example, were brought together by Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau in an effort to ground political order in a purely human world. Society was conceived as a voluntary association of individuals; and the aim of this association was the preservation of natural rights to such goods as life, liberty, and property. Social authority, then, was derived from the individuals who had contracted to live together and to pursue certain human goals. This analysis of society was at the root of the revolutionary social criticism of the eighteenth century.

When men came to conceive the order of society as flowing from the rational character of society itself; when they came to criticize institutions from the point of view of their immediate function in preserving order, and criticized that order from the point of view of its purpose and function; when they approached the study of the state from the point of view of political science; then, of course, they found themselves in opposition to the medieval attitude which accepted its institutions as given by God to the church (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 13-14).

But the outcome of "the revolution," according to Mead, was not what the philosophers of the age of reason had expected. The institutions of the medieval past (e.g., monarchy, theocracy, economic feudalism) were either eliminated or severely limited in their scope and power. But the new regime contained reactionary elements of its own. The victorious bourgeoisie began to build a new class society based on the dialectic of capital and labor; and in this new society, the rights of man came to be conceived in terms of the successful struggle for economic power (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 223). Each man came to be viewed as "an economic unit," and the freedom of man became the freedom to compete for profits in the market (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 217).

The initial effects of the rise of capitalist society were disastrous for the working classes. "When labor was brought into the factory centers, there sprang up great cities in which men and women lived in almost impossible conditions. And there sprang up factories built around the machine in which men, women, and children worked under ever so hideous conditions" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 206). This situation was rationalized by an ideology that defined human rights in terms of economic competition and that "regarded industry as that which provided the morale of a laborer community" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 207).

Under such conditions, the rights and liberties for which "the revolution" had been fought became more ideological than real. It was only after the subsequent rise of the trade union and socialist movements that the contradiction between ideology and reality began to be transcended.

While "the revolution" was at least partially fulfilled in England and America, it was, from the standpoint of the early nineteenth century, a total failure on the European continent. The French Revolution deteriorated into a period of political terror that laid the foundation for the emergence of Napoleon's imperialism. The ideals of liberty, equality, and fraternity proved inadequate as bases for a fully rational society.

These ideals, in Mead's view, are politically naive. The concept of freedom is negative; it is a demand "that the individual shall be free from restraint" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 22). In the actual political world, where there is a conflict of wills, the concept of freedom falls into contradiction with itself. The freedom of one individual or group often infringes upon the freedom of another individual or group (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 22).

The concept of equality, which demands that "each person shall have . . . the same political [and perhaps economic] standing as every other person" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 23), is also far removed from the actual conditions of political and economic life. According to Mead, any society is a complex organization of many individuals and groups. These individuals and groups possess varying degrees of power and prestige. Given this situation, the concept of equality is at most an ideal to be pursued; but it is not a description of what goes on the in the concrete social world.

Similarly, the ideal of fraternity, the idea of the comradeship of all humanity, is "much too vague to be made the basis for the organization of the state." The concept of fraternity ignores the fact that, all too often, "people have to depend upon their sense of hostility to other persons in order to identify themselves with their own group" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 24).

The ideals of liberty, equality, and fraternity are, from Mead's standpoint, abstract ideals that could not survive the post-revolutionary struggles for political supremacy and the control of property.

The Romantic movement emerged in the aftermath of the failure of "the revolution." "There came a sense of defeat, after the breakdown of the Revolution, after the failure to organize a society on the basis of liberty, equality, and fraternity. And it is out of this sense of defeat that a new movement arose, a movement which in general terms passes under the title of 'romanticism'" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 57). The failure of "the revolution" left Europe in confusion. The European's ties to his medieval past had been severed, but his revolutionary hopes had not been realized. He was caught between two worlds. He could not be sure of his identity. His sense of self was in crisis. The Romantic movement was an attempt to overcome this crisis by returning to and reconstructing the European past. Romanticism, then, was an effort to reestablish the continuity between the past, present, and future of European culture.

Romantic Self-Consciousness

The Romantic conception of the self was an outgrowth of Kant's critique of associationism. "What took place in the Romantic period along a philosophical line was to take this [the?] transcendental unity of apperception, which was for Kant a bare logical function, together with the postulation of the self which we could not possibly know but which Kant said we could not help assuming, and compose them into the new romantic self" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 67). The Romantic self, however, was not conceived of as transcendental. The Romantics did not "postulate" the self; they asserted it "as something which is directly given in experience" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 86). The Romantics agreed with Kant that the self is the basis of all knowledge and judgment. But while the Kantian self had been developed as a regulative concept in the attempt to render experience intelligible, the Romantic self was held to be actually constitutive of experience. The Romantics, Mead argues, established "the existence of our self as the primary fact. That is what we insist upon. That is what gives the standard to values. In that situation the self puts itself forward as its ultimate reality" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 62). Thus, for the Romantics, knowledge of the self was not only possible, but was viewed as the highest form of knowledge.

At the heart of the Romantic preoccupation with self-consciousness was the question of the relation between subject and object. This question, we have seen, is also a central concern in Mead's ontology and epistemology. Philosophically, the Romantic analysis of the subject- object relation arose in relation to what Mead calls "the age-old problem of knowledge: How can one get any assurance that that which appears in our cognitive experience is real?" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 80). The early modern revolt of reason against authority had ended in a skepticism which, Mead writes, "shattered all the statements, all the doctrines, of the medieval philosophy. It had even torn to pieces the philosophy of the Renaissance. It had [with Hume's analysis of causation] shattered the natural structure of the world which the Renaissance science had presented in such simplicity and yet such majesty, that causal structure that led Kant to say that there were two things that overwhelmed him, the starry heavens above and the moral law within" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 80). The Romantics were reacting against this skeptical attitude. They approached the problem of knowledge from the standpoint of the self. The self, for the Romantics, was the pre-condition of experience; and experience, therefore, including the experience of objects, was to be understood in relation to the self. The epistemological problem of Romantic philosophy was to assimilate the not-self to the self, to encompass the objective world within the subjective world, to make the universe- at-large an intimate part of self-consciousness.

Self-consciousness, as was pointed out above, operates in the "reflexive mode." In self- consciousness, the self appears as both subject and object. We can be conscious of our consciousness. Mead points out that this reflexivity of consciousness is the foundation of Descartes' affirmation of the existence of the self. But Romantic self-consciousness goes beyond the Cartesian cogito in observing that "the self does not exist except in relation to something else" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 74). Self implies not-self; subject implies object. For every subject, there is an object; and for every object, there is a subject. "There cannot be one without the other" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 78).

The latter insight of Romantic thought is reflected, in a different form, in Mead's doctrine of perspectives. The Romantic view of the object as a constitutive element in experience marks a movement away from Cartesian subjectivism and toward the objectification of experience that occurs in Mead's perspectivism. "For Descartes, I am conscious and therefore exist; for the romanticist, I am conscious of myself and therefore this self, of which I am conscious, exists and with it the objects it knows. The object of knowledge, in this mode at least, is given as there with the same assurance that the thinker is given in the action of thought" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 83).

Romanticism, then, as Mead presents it, is not an extreme subjectivism. "The romantic attitude is rather the externalizing of the self. One projects one's self into the world, sees the world through the guise, the veil, of one's own emotions. That is the essential feature of the Romantic attitude" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 75). The world exists in relation to the self; but the world is (objectively) there as a necessary structure of human experience. Self and not-self, subject and object, are not contradictories, but dialectical polarities.

Another aspect of Romantic self-consciousness is the view that the self is a dynamic process. The polarity of self and not-self is not a static structure, but an ongoing relationship, "something that is going on" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 88)."The very existence of the self," Mead writes,

implies a not-self; it implies a not-self which can be identified with the self. You have seen that the term "self" is a reflexive affair. It involves an attitude of separation of the self from itself. Both subject and object are involved in the self in order that it may exist. The self must be identified, in some sense, with the not-self. It must be able to come back at itself from the outside. The process, then, as involved in the self is the subject-object process, a process within which both of these phases of experience lie, a process in which these different phases can be identified with each other — not necessarily as the same phase but at least as expressions of the same process (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 88).

The upshot of this point of view, according to Mead, is an activist or pragmatic conception of mind and knowledge. Knowing is a process involving the interaction of self and not-self. Knowledge is a result of a process in which the self takes action with reference to the not-self, in which the not-self is appropriated by the self. In this analysis of the Romantic epistemology, the germ of Mead's own "philosophy of the act" is apparent. The interaction of self and not-self is the foundation, not only of our knowledge of the world, but also of our knowledge of the self. Self-consciousness requires the objectification of the self. The Romantic elucidation of the polarity of self and not-self makes self-objectification (and therefore self- consciousness) theoretically comprehensible. In action toward the not-self, self-discovery becomes possible.

The world, according to Mead, "is organized only in so far as one acts in it. Its meaning lies in the conduct of the individual; and when one has built up his world as such a field of action, then he realizes himself as the individual who carried out that action. That is the only way in which he can achieve a self. One does not get at himself simply by turning upon himself the eye of introspection. One realizes himself in what he does, in the ends which he sets up, and in the means he takes to accomplish those ends" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 90). The world is a field of action. In this field, there are tasks to be accomplished; and it is through the accomplishing of tasks, through the appropriation of the not-self by the self, that the self is enlarged and actualized.

Thus, in Mead's analysis, philosophical Romanticism provides a theoretical description of the conditions under which self-consciousness is possible. The fundamental condition of self-consciousness, as we have seen, is self- objectification. However, for Mead, the basic process of self-objectification takes place in interpersonal experience. "We have to realize ourselves by taking the role of another, playing the part of another, taking the attitude of the community toward ourselves, continually seeing ourselves as others see us, regarding ourselves from the standpoint of those about us. This is not the self- consciousness that goes with awkwardness and uneasiness. It is the assured recognition of one's own position, one's social relations, that comes from being able to take the attitude of others toward ourselves" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 95). This interpretation of self- consciousness, which is the essence of Mead's theory of the self, has its roots in the Romantic analysis of the relation between self and not-self.

History and Romantic Self-Consciousness

There is a close connection between historical consciousness and self- consciousness in Romantic thought. The Romantic movement arose out of the failure of the bourgeois revolution. The hopes of the age of reason had not been realized, and the European was faced with a crisis in his sense of historical identity. Romantic consciousness, Mead argues, was a "discouraged" consciousness. In reaction to a disappointing present, the Romantics looked back to the Middle Ages for a model of life that carried with it a certain security. But the bourgeois revolution, for all its failures, had created a new concept of the individual. Post- revolutionary man "looked at himself as having his own rights, regarded himself as having his own feet to stand on." In the Romantic period, European man experienced himself as an individual. "This gave him a certain independence which he did not have before; it gave him a certain self- consciousness that he never had before" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 59-61). Thus,

Europe discovered the medieval period in the Romantic period . . . ; but it also discovered itself. In fact, it discovered itself first. Furthermore, it discovered the apparatus by means of which this self-discovery was possible. The self belongs to the reflexive mode. One senses the self only in so far as the self assumes the role of another so that it becomes both subject and object in the same experience. This is the thing of great importance in this whole historical movement (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 63).

The Romantic view of the Middle Ages, then, arose with reference to a problematic present and constituted an attempt on the part of European man to reconstruct the continuity of his experience. This reconstruction of historical time — which is, as suggested above, a collective time — resulted in the creation of a new sense of collective identity. The Romantic conception of the medieval past developed as an effort to redefine the self. European man had, in a sense, lost his self, and he turned to history in an attempt to recapture his sense of continuity. "What the Romantic period revealed, then, was not simply a past, but a past as the point of view from which to come back upon the self. One has to grow into the attitude of the other, come back to the self, to realize the self . . . . " (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 60).

Romanticism, in Mead's view, "is a reconstruction of the self through the self's assuming the roles of the great figures of the past" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 62). In placing oneself at the standpoint of others in the past, one can view oneself in a new light. Here, Mead reveals still another form of experience — historical experience — in which the self might be objectified. "That is, the self looked back at is own past as it found it in history. It looked back at it and gave the past a new form as that out of which it had sprung. It put itself back into the past. It lived over again the adventures and achievements of those old heroes with an interest which children have for the lives of their parents — taking their roles and realizing not only the past but the present itself in that process" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 69). In the Romantic search for the "historical connections" between past and present, a new past was created, and, with it, a new sense of "how the present had grown out of the past" emerged. History, viewed from the standpoint of Romantic self-consciousness, became the description of "an organized past" which rendered the problematic present of the Romantic period intelligible. Romantic self- consciousness turned to the past, reconstructed the past, and made the past one of the main foundations of the self. Romantic self-consciousness was thereby expanded and deepened through historical consciousness. We might say that the Romantic movement reconstructed western self-consciousness through a reconstruction of western historical consciousness.

The bourgeois revolution had sundered the connection between the past and present of early 19th century Europe and had left the future in question. It was the task of the Romantic movement to redefine European self- consciousness by way of a reconstruction of the continuity of historical time. In so doing, the Romantic movement revealed the present-directedness and future- directedness of historical consciousness and developed, by the way, an historically significant conception of the self as rooted in the experience of time.

c. History and the Idea of the Future

The idea of evolution is central in Mead's philosophy. For Mead, experience is fundamentally processual and temporal. Experience is the undergoing of change. Mead's entire ontology is an expression of evolutionary thinking. His concept of reality-as- process is ecological in structure and dynamic in content. Nature is a system of systems, a multiplicity of "transacting" fields and centers of activity. The relation between organism and environment (percipient event and consentient set) is mutual and dynamic. Both organism and environment are active: the activity of the organism alters the environment, and the activity of the environment alters the organism. There is no way of separating the two in reality, no way of telling which is primary and which secondary. Thus, Mead's employment of the concept of evolution is an aspect of his attempt to avoid the behavioristic and environmentalist determinism that would regard the organism as passive and as subject to the caprices of nature.

History as Evolution

Mead's concept of evolution is stated in social terms. In Mead's ontology, the entire realm of nature is described as social. The ontological principle of sociality is a fundamentally evolutionary concept that describes reality as a process in which percipient events adjust to new situations and adapt themselves to a variety of consentient sets.

Mind, as an emergent in the social act of communication, "lies inside of a process of conduct" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 345) and is temporally structured. Reflective intelligence is the peculiarly human way of overcoming the conflicts in experience; it is called into play when action is inhibited, and it has reference to a future situation in which the inhibition is overcome (Mind, Self and Society 90). And since, as we have seen, the reconstruction of the past is an important element in the temporal organization of human action, historical consciousness becomes a significant instrument in the human evolutionary process. Historical thought redefines the present in terms of a reinterpreted and reconstructed past and thereby facilitates passage into the future.

Human existence, then, is described by Mead in terms of evolution, temporality, and historicity. Human life involves a constant reconstruction of reality with reference to changing conditions and newly emergent situations. This process of evolutionary reconstruction, according to Mead, is evident in institutional change. The historical consciousness fostered by the Romantic movement has permitted us to view human institutions as "structures which arose in a process, and which simply expressed that process at a certain moment" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 149). For Mead, the ideas of process and structure do not exclude each other, but are related dialectically in actual historical developments. Historical thought, then, becomes one way of getting into "the structure, the movement, the current of the process" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 149).

Historical consciousness is a way of comprehending change. But it is also a way of fostering change; that is, by comprehending the direction of historical change, one can place oneself within a given current of change and pursue the historical success of that current. In this way, the historically minded individual or group can contribute to the development of new structures within the process of time. This, as Mead points out, is a way of "carrying over revolution into evolution" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 149).

Mead's conception of historical consciousness is rooted in his view of intelligence as the reconstruction of human experience in response to "new situations." As has been shown earlier, Mead views the novel event as the basis of intelligent conduct. "If there were no new situations, our conduct would be entirely habitual . . . . Conscious beings are those that are continually adjusting themselves, using their past experience, reconstructing their methods of conduct . . . . That is what intelligence consists in, not in finding out once and for all what the order of nature is and then acting in certain prescribed forms, but rather in continual readjustment" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 290). The historical resort to the past has reference to new situations that emerge in a present and that suggest a future. Human thought, including historical consciousness, is a confrontation with novelty and is aimed at passing from a problematic present to a non-problematic future. And the past is called in and reconstructed in relation to this project of coming to grips with the novelty of experience. "When what emerges is novel, the explanation of this novelty is sought in an order of events in the past which was not previously recognized" (Mead, "Relative Space-Time and Simultaneity" 529). Historical consciousness, as we have seen in the case of the Romantic movement, is instrumental in redefining and maintaining the temporal continuity of human experience.

Novelty, for Mead, is the foundation of consciousness, intelligence, and the freedom of conduct; it is the ground of human experience. "As far as experience is concerned, if everything novel were abandoned, experience itself would cease" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 290). Human experience is temporal, and, as such, it "involves the continual appearance of that which is new." Thus, "we are always advancing into a future which is different from the past" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 290). The future is open, and in acting toward the future, man becomes an active agent in the formulation of his own existence.

Although reality always exists in a present, the telos of this reality is to be found in the future. In Mead's view, the future is a factor, perhaps the main factor, in directing our conduct. It is the nature of intelligent conduct to be future-directed. "We are moving on, in the very nature of the case, in a process in which the past is moving into the present and into the future" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 509).

Human-directedness-toward-the-future is the foundation of freedom. The mechanistic view of the world is inadequate as an account of freedom; in fact, mechanism, since it denies the possibility of final causes and attempts to explain everything in terms of efficient causes, must deny the possibility of freedom. And yet, the "essence of conduct" is that "it is directed toward goals, ends which, while not yet actual, are operative in the determination of the directions which conduct shall take" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 317).

Goals, unlike efficient causes, are selected by the organism; and our selection of goals is not explicable (or predictable) on the basis of efficient causes. Thus, "the interpenetration of experience does go into the future. The essence of reality involves the future as essential to itself . . . . The coming of the future into our conduct is the very nature of our freedom" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 317).

Human action is action toward the future. The past does not determine (although it does condition) human conduct; it is, rather, human conduct that determines the past. Human action takes place in a present that opens on the future, and it is in terms of the emergent present and impending future that the content and meaning of the past are determined. Human acts are teleological rather than mechanical. Thus, as Strauss indicates, Mead's evolutionism permits him "to challenge mechanical conceptions of action and the world and to restate problems of autonomy, freedom and innovation in evolutionary and social rather than mechanistic and individualistic terms" (xviii).

The Ideal of History

Although Mead describes human existence as evolving toward an open future that cannot be prefigured with any finality, he does not ignore the fact that there are ideals that are operative in directing human action. "Cognizant of social realities and wary of utopian panaceas, [writes Reck,] resorting to the method of science in questions of morality rather than to authoritative religions or traditional customs, aware that men consist of impulses and instincts as well as of intelligence, Mead nevertheless discerned that there are ideal ends that operate as standards and goals for human conduct" ("Introduction" xl). That many of the ideal ends humans have pursued have been naive (that is, at odds with the realities of social and political life) is clear in Mead's criticism of the notions of liberty, equality, and fraternity. Attempts to convert such ideals into realities have often met with frustration in the ironies of history. It is for this reason that Mead argues that ideal ends, in some sense, must be grounded in historical reality; otherwise they become either fanciful wishes or mere ideological and rhetorical pronouncements.

Of the many ideals that have influenced human conduct, Mead selects one for special consideration: the ideal of the universal community. This ideal has appeared time and again in the history of human thought and is, in Mead's view, "the ideal or ultimate goal of human social progress" (Mind, Self and Society 310). The ideal of the universal community is, then, the ideal of history. According to this ideal, the goal of history is the establishment of "a society in which everyone is going to recognize the interests of everyone else," a society "in which the golden rule is to be the rule of conduct, that is, a society in which everyone is to make the interests of others his own interest" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 362). The vision of the universal community is, in fact, the basis of the philosophy of history as a distinctive form of thought. "A philosophy of history arose as soon as men conceived that society was moving toward the realization of triumphant ends in some great far-off event. It became necessary to relate present conduct and transient values to the ultimate values toward which creation moved" (The Philosophy of the Act 504). This is the eschatological vision that is at the root of the historical conceptions of St. Paul, St. Augustine, Hegel, Marx, Herbert Spencer, and as we shall see, of Mead himself.

The ideal of the universal community is, however, "an abstraction" in as much as it is not actualized in the concrete world. In the life of the realities of political and social conflict (e.g., the conflict between private and public interests), the ideal of the universal community stands outside of history. And yet, this ideal is, in a sense, an historical ideal; that is, the ideal of the universal community, although not explicit in history, is, according to Mead, implicit in the historical process. The ideal is, on the one hand, operative in the hopes of mankind, and, on the other hand, it is potentially present in certain concrete historical forces. Among these historical forces, Mead finds three of particular importance: (1) the universal religions; (2) universal economic processes; and (3) the process of communication.

Both economic processes and universal religions tend toward a universal community. Religious and economic attitudes tend potentially toward "a social organization which goes beyond the actual structure in which individuals find themselves involved" (Mind, Self and Society 290). Commerce and love are both potentially universalizing ideas, and both have been significant factors in the development of human societies. The forces of exchange and love know no boundaries; all men are included (although abstractly) in the community of exchange and love. Although the religious attitude is a more profound form of identifying with others, the economic process, precisely because of its relative superficiality, "can travel more rapidly and make possible easier communication." "It is important to recognize," Mead writes, that these religious and economic developments toward a universal community are "going on in history" (Mind, Self and Society 296-197). That is, the movement toward a universal community is an immanent process and not merely an abstract idea. Human history seems to imply a universal community.

A third historical force that implies universality is the process of communication, to which Mead devotes so much of his attention in his various works. Language, as we have seen, is the matrix of social coordination. A linguistic gesture is an action which implies a response from another and which is dependent for its meaning on that response. The process of communication is a way of gesturing toward others, a way of transcending oneself, a way of taking the role of another. The linguistic act both presupposes and implies a human community of unspecified and unlimited extension.

"Language," according to Mead, "provides a universal community which is something like the economic community" (Mind, Self and Society 283). It is through significant communication that the individual is able to generalize her experience to include the experiences of others. The world of "thought and reason" that emerges out of the social act of communication is, almost by definition, transpersonal and therefore verges toward the universal. Social organization and social interaction require a commonality of meaning, a "universe of discourse," within which individual acts can take on significance (Mind, Self and Society 89-90). The process of significant communication is the source of this universe of discourse.

It is Mead's contention that "the thought world" created in significant communication constitutes the widest of human communities to date. The group "defined by the logical universe of discourse" is that which is the most general of all human groups — the one that "claims the largest number of individual members." This group is based on "the universal functioning of gestures as significant symbols in the general human social process of communication" (Mind, Self and Society 157-158). This universalizing tendency of language comes closer to the realization of the ideal community than do the religious and economic attitudes. These latter, moreover, actually presuppose the communicational process: religion and economics organize themselves as social acts on the basis of communication.

Mead thus states the ideal of history in primarily communicational terms:

The human social ideal . . . is the attainment of a universal human society in which all human individuals would possess a perfected social intelligence, such that all social meanings would each be similarly reflected in their respective individual consciousnesses — such that the meanings of any one individual's acts or gestures (as realized by him and expressed in the structure of his self, through his ability to take the social attitudes of other individuals toward himself and toward their common social ends or purposes) would be the same for any other individual whatever who responded to them(Mind, Self and Society 310).

Mead's vision seems to imply a society of many personalities (Mind, Self and Society 324-325) in perfect communication with one another. Every person would be capable of putting herself into the place of every other person. Such a system of perfect communication, in which the meanings of all symbols are fully transparent, would realize the ideal of a universal human community.

Mead recognizes, of course, how far we are from realizing the universal community. Our religions, our economic systems, and our communicational processes are severely limited. At present, these historical forces separate us as much as they unite us. All three, for example, are conditioned by another historical force which has a fragmenting rather than a universalizing effect on modern culture, namely, nationalism (see Mead, Selected Writings 355- 370). Mead points out that "the limitation of social organization is found in the inability of individuals to place themselves in the perspectives of others, to take their points of view" (The Philosophy of the Present 165). This limitation is far from overcome in contemporary life. And "the ideal human society cannot exist as long as it is impossible for individuals to enter into the attitudes of those whom they are affecting in the performance of their particular functions" (Mind, Self and Society 328). Contemporary culture is a world culture; we all affect each other politically, culturally, economically. Nonetheless, "the actual society in which universality can get its expression has not risen" (Mind, Self and Society 267).

But it is also true that the ideal of the universal community is present by implication in our religions, in our economic systems, and in our communicational acts. The ideal is there as a directive in human history. It implies an evolution toward an ideal goal and informs our conduct accordingly.

Mead's social idealism is not utopian, but historical. The ideal of history, the ideal of the universal community, is "an ideal of method, not of program. It indicates direction, not destination" (The Philosophy of the Act 519). And in so far as this ideal informs our actual conduct in the historical world, it is a concrete rather than an abstract universal (The Philosophy of the Act 518-519). The ideal of history is both transcendent and immanent; it is rooted in the past and present, but leads into the future which is always awaiting realization.

Historical thought, then, for Mead, is instrumental in the evolution of human society. It is through the constant reconstruction of experience that human intelligence and human society are expanded. Mead's evolutionary conception of human history is clearly a progressive notion which he seeks to document throughout his writings. There is implicit in human history a tendency toward a larger and larger sense of community. The ultimate formulation of this historical tendency is found in the ideal of the universal community. This ideal is not purely abstract (that is, extra-historical), but is rooted in actual historical forces such as the universal religions, modern economic forces, and the human communicational process. According to Mead, it is this ideal of the universal community that informs the human evolutionary process and that indicates the implicit direction or teleology of history.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

Books

  • Mind, Self, and Society, ed. C.W. Morris (University of Chicago 1934)
  • Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century, ed. M.H. Moore (University of Chicago 1936)
  • The Philosophy of the Act, ed. C.W. Morris et al. (University of Chicago 1938).
  • The Philosophy of the Present, ed. A.E. Murphy (Open Court 1932)
  • Selected Writings, ed. A.J. Reck (Bobbs-Merrill, Liberal Arts Press, 1964).

Articles

  • "A Behavioristic Account of the Significant Symbol," Journal of Philosophy, 19 (1922): 157-63.
  • "Bishop Berkeley and his Message," Journal of Philosophy, 26 (1929): 421- 30.
  • "Concerning Animal Perception," Psychological Review, 14 (1907): 383- 90.
  • "Cooley's Contribution to American Social Thought," American Journal of Sociology, 35 (1930): 693-706.
  • "The Definition of the Psychical," Decennial Publications of the U. of Chicago, 1st Series, Vol. III (1903): 77-112.
  • "The Genesis of the Self and Social Control," International Journal of Ethics, 35 (1925), pp. 251-77.
  • "Image or Sensation," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Method, 1 (1904): 604-7.
  • "The Imagination in Wundt's Treatment of Myth and Religion," Psychological Bulletin, 3 (1906): 393-9.
  • "Josiah Royce - A Personal Impression," International Journal of Ethics, 27 (1917): 168-70.
  • "The Mechanism of Social Consciousness," J. of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods, 9 (1912): 401-6.
  • "National-Mindedness and International-Mindedness," International Journal of Ethics, 39 (1929): 385-407.
  • "Natural Rights and the Theory of the Political Institution," Journal of Philosophy, 12 (1915): 141-55.
  • "The Nature of Aesthetic Experience," International Journal of Ethics, 36 (1925-1926): 382-93.
  • "The Nature of the Past," in Essays in Honor of John Dewey, ed. by J. Coss (Henry Holt 1929): 235-42.
  • "A New Criticism of Hegelianism: Is It Valid?," American Journal of Theology, 5 (1901): 87-96.
  • "The Objective Reality of Perspectives," Proceedings of the 6th Internat'l Congress of Philosophy (1926): 75-85.
  • "The Philosophical Basis of Ethics," International Journal of Ethics, 18 (1908): 311-23.
  • "A Pragmatic Theory of Truth," in University of California Publications in Philosophy, 11 (1929): 65-88.
  • "The Psychology of Social Consciousness Implied in Instruction," Science, 31 (1910): 688-93.
  • "The Relation of Play to Education," University of Chicago Record, 1 (1896): 140-5.
  • "The Relation of Psychology and Philology," Psychological Bulletin, 1 (1904): 375-91.
  • "Relative Space-Time and Simultaneity," ed. D.L. Miller, Review of Metaphysics, 17 (1964): 511-535.
  • "Royce, James, & Dewey in Their American Setting," Internat'l Journal of Ethics, 40 (1929): 211-31.
  • "Scientific Method & the Individual Thinker," in Creative Intelligence, ed. J. Dewey et al. (Holt 1917): 176-227.
  • "Scientific Method and the Moral Sciences," International Journal of Ethics, 33 (1923), pp. 229-47.
  • "Social Consciousness and the Consciousness of Meaning," Psychological Bulletin, 7 (1910): 397-405.
  • "Social Psychology as Counterpart to Physiological Psychology," Psychological Bulletin, 6 (1909): 401-8.
  • "The Social Self," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods, 10 (1913): 374-80.
  • "Suggestions Towards a Theory of the Philosophical Disciplines," Philosophical Review, 9 (1900): 1-17.
  • "A Theory of Emotions from the Physiological Standpoint," Psychological Review (1895): 162-4.
  • "A Translation of Wundt's 'Folk Psychology'," American Journal of Theology, 23 (1919): 533-36.
  • "What Social Objects Must Psychology Presuppose?," J. of Phil., Psych. & Scientific Methods, 7 (1910): 174-80.
  • "The Working Hypothesis in Social Reform," American Journal of Sociology, 5 (1899): 367-71.

b. Secondary Sources

http://paradigm.soci.brocku.ca/~lward/frame2.html (click on "Commentaries").

The following is a selection of books and articles that I have found especially helpful in my own work on Mead.

Books

  • Aboulafia, Mitchell. The Mediating Self: Mead, Sartre and Self- Determination (Yale 1986).
  • Aboulafia, Mitchell (ed.). Philosophy, Social Theory and the Thought of George Herbert Mead (SUNY 1991).
  • Baldwin, John D. George Herbert Mead: A Unifying Theory for Sociology, (Sage 1986).
  • Cook, Gary A. George Herbert Mead: The Making of a Social Pragmatist (University of Illinois 1993).
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Author Information

George Cronk
Email: gcronk@bergen.edu
Bergen Community College
U. S. A.

Charles Sanders Peirce: Pragmatism

Pragmatism is a principle of inquiry and account of meaning first proposed by C. S. Peirce in the 1870s. The crux of Peirce’s pragmatism is that for any statement to be meaningful, it must have practical bearings. Peirce saw the pragmatic account of meaning as a method for clearing up metaphysics and aiding scientific inquiry. This has led many to take Peirce’s early statement of pragmatism as a forerunner of the verificationist account of meaning championed by logical positivists. The early pragmatism of C.S. Peirce developed through the work of James and Dewey in the U. S. A, and F. C. S. Schiller in Great Britain. Peirce, however, remained unhappy with both his early formulations and the developments made by fellow pragmatists. This lead him, in later life, to refine his own earlier account and rename it “pragmaticism” in order to distinguish it from other more “nominalistic” versions.

The most widely known feature of Peirce’s philosophy is his account of pragmatism. Peirce made his first published attempts at formulating pragmatism in the 1870s, and the maxim he developed there is often regarded as a prototype of the verification principle proposed by logical positivists in the early twentieth century. This early body of work on pragmatism influenced William James who, some twenty years later, publicly declared for the doctrine, named Peirce as its originator, and made the theory common philosophical knowledge. Both Peirce and James took pragmatism to have its roots in older work than Peirce’s late nineteenth century theory. Peirce in particular saw traces of the theory in the work of Kant.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Peirce’s Early Pragmatism
    1. The Purpose of the Maxim
    2. The Maxim and “Hardness”
  3. Peirce’s Later Pragmatism
  4. The Pragmatic Maxim and the Verification Principle
  5. General Problems with The Maxim
  6. Peirce and James: Pragmatism and Pragmaticism
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

The most widely known feature of Peirce’s philosophy is his account of pragmatism. Peirce made his first published attempts at formulating pragmatism in the 1870s, and the maxim he developed there is often regarded as a prototype of the verification principle proposed by logical positivists in the early twentieth century. This early body of work on pragmatism influenced William James who, some twenty years later, publicly declared for the doctrine, named Peirce as its originator, and made the theory common philosophical knowledge. Both Peirce and James took pragmatism to have its roots in older work than Peirce’s late nineteenth century theory. Peirce in particular saw traces of the theory in the work of Kant. However, what Peirce did in the 1870s was to create the first clear formulation of pragmatism as a principle of inquiry and account of meaning.

Peirce returned repeatedly to his early formulations and especially in his later life and worked and re-worked his pragmatic theories, particularly in reaction to the work of William James. Clearly, then, there are two strands to Peirce’s pragmatism: his early statements of the 1870’s and his later work from around the turn of the twentieth century.

2. Peirce’s Early Pragmatism

The earliest clear statement of Peirce’s pragmatism comes from his 1878 paper “How To Make Our Ideas Clear.” In this paper, Peirce introduces a maxim, or principle, which allows us to achieve the highest grade of clarity about the concepts we use. Peirce introduces this principle, which we shall discuss in detail below as the third grade of clarity, as a development of the rationalist notion of “clear and distinct ideas.” Combining his pragmatic maxim with notions of clarity from Descartes and Leibniz, Peirce identifies three grades of clarity or understanding.

The first grade of clarity about a concept is to have an unreflective grasp of it in everyday experience. For instance, my inclination to keep some part of my body in stable contact with a supported horizontal surface at all times suggests that I have an underlying grasp of gravity. The second grade of clarity is to have, or be capable of providing, a definition of the concept. This definition should also be abstracted from any particular experience, i.e., it should be general. So, my ability to provide a definition of gravity (as, say, a force which attracts objects to a point, like the center of the earth) represents a grade of clarity or understanding over and above my unreflective use of that concept in walking, remaining upright, etc.

For Peirce, these two grades of clarity are only part way to a full understanding of a concept; there is a richer level of clarity. It is at this point that he introduces his own third grade of clarity. Peirce says:

Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then the whole of our conception of those effects is the whole of our conception of the object. (Peirce 1878/1992, p. 132)

On this account, then, to have a full understanding of some concept we must not only be familiar with it in day to day encounters, and be able to offer a definition of it, we must also know what effects to expect from holding that concept to be true.

For instance, a full understanding of the concept of “vinegar” comes from possessing all three grades of clarity about it. If I am able to identify vinegar and use the concept appropriately in my everyday experiences, I display the first grade of clarity about this concept. My ability to define “vinegar” as a diluted form of acetic acid, which is sharp to the taste, displays the second grade of clarity. Finally, from the use of “vinegar” in definitional propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid” and “vinegar is sharp to taste,” I can derive a list of conditional propositions which indicate what to expect from actions upon, and interactions with, this concept. So, for instance, “vinegar is acetic acid” would lead me to form the expectation that “If vinegar is acetic acid, then if I dip litmus paper into it, it will turn red.” Having a list of conditional propositions like this, which express the differences this concept can make to expected experiences, allows me to achieve the highest grade of clarity about that concept. This third and final grade of clarity is the earliest statement of what we now know as the pragmatic maxim; it is the crux of Peirce’s early theory of pragmatism.

It should be clear that Peirce’s pragmatic maxim accords with his scientific inclinations. For Peirce, understanding the practical upshot of our concepts means exploring and experimenting upon the conditional hypotheses that we formulate with them. This not only reflects his broader notion of philosophy as a practical laboratory science, but also informs our conception of Peirce’s pragmatic maxim, as it is expressed in “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” as an account of meaning. The meaning of a concept is expressed by the list of conditional hypotheses that it generates. Interestingly, this seems to generate an account of meaning with two main elements: use and understanding.

The use element of the pragmatic maxim as an account of meaning is apparent from the meanings of the conditionals generated with the maxim. For instance, the meaning expressed by conditional statements about “vinegar” are not strictly about that concept considered in isolation. Rather, they provide the meaning for propositions containing the concept, such as “vinegar is diluted acetic acid,” or “vinegar is sharp to taste.” These conditional statements concern the practical experimental upshot of these propositions, rather than of the concept abstracted from them. This seems to generate meaning for concepts as they are used in sentences and propositions. It also makes the account of meaning an account of meaning for whole sentences, etc.

The second element of the pragmatic maxim as an account of meaning is understanding. We can see that it is the possibility of our understanding the outcome of taking a hypothesis to be true (in the form of conditional statements) that expresses the meaning of a concept. Since a meaningful statement is one for which we can derive practical and experiential consequences, our understanding, or grasp of those consequences, is our understanding or grasp of the meaning.

a. The Purpose of the Maxim

The pragmatic maxim, then, is the means for achieving the third grade of clarity in our understanding of a concept. The list of conditional statements that we generate for a concept lists the effects and practical outcome that we can expect from this concept if the statements containing it turn out to be true. However, Peirce develops the pragmatic maxim and the clarifying method that it represents with some very particular purpose in mind.

As we have already suggested, Peirce’s main use for the pragmatic maxim is as an account of meaning. Quite simply, this enables Peirce to clearly identify useful and meaningful sentences. For instance, if we do not conceive the object of our conceptions to have any practical bearings, then it clearly does not have meaning. This ability to identify meaningful and meaningless statements allows Peirce to make use of the maxim in two ways.

The first use for the pragmatic maxim is the role it plays in Peirce’s account of Inquiry and the accompanying notions of truth and reality. For Peirce, the attainment of truth comes from taking investigation and inquiry as far as it can go. The beliefs we find ourselves accepting at the limit of inquiry represent the truth. What is more, for Peirce, the only way to take inquiry to its limit is through the adoption of a scientific method. However, some criterion of choice is required in order to find which statements/hypotheses etc. are worth investigating. For Peirce, the pragmatic maxim is just such a criterion. Put in its simplest terms, the pragmatic maxim allows us to see what difference the truth of certain concepts would make to our lives. This knowledge further allows us to decide where the best focus for our scientific investigations and belief-settling inquiry lies. If, of two concepts, our investigating the truth of one over the other is likely to have a greater impact upon our reaching a settled state of opinion, then that is the one we should investigate. The only way we are able to see which of the two concepts is likely to have a greater impact is to use the pragmatic maxim and the final grade of clarity or understanding that it affords us.

Peirce’s second use for the pragmatic maxim is to identify those propositions of metaphysics that turn out to be meaningless. For Peirce, the pragmatic maxim enables us to steer clear of metaphysical distractions. The bulk of “ontological metaphysics,” by which Peirce means metaphysics conducted by a priori reasoning alone, has no practical bearing and so will make no contribution to the final fixed state of beliefs. This renders them meaningless. It is this use of the pragmatic maxim as a filter against empty metaphysical statements that ultimately leads to a comparison between Peirce’s maxim and the verification principles of the logical positivists. We will look at the similarities between Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and verificationist accounts of meaning in due course, but for the time being, it is worth noting that both Peirce and the logical positivists see the possibility of ruling out much of metaphysics on the grounds that it has no experiential consequences.

b. The Maxim and “Hardness”

Very quickly, Peirce began to feel that there were difficulties with this early account of the pragmatic maxim. In “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” Peirce used the concept of “hardness” to illustrate the usefulness of his pragmatic maxim. This lead him to the conditional statement that “If something is hard, it will not be scratched by many other things” as an example, amongst many, of the practical upshot of taking our concept of “hardness” to be true. However, Peirce goes on to raise the question: what do we say about the hardness of a diamond, destroyed before we are able to test it for that quality?

In response, Peirce says that it would not be false to say that the diamond in question was soft. He states that, “there is absolutely no difference between a hard and a soft thing so long as they are not brought to the test” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 131). Peirce’s unwillingness to say that the diamond is hard is, in part, a consequence of the way he ties his pragmatic maxim to his account of inquiry. Since any belief that we form about this particular diamond will fail to meet with recalcitrant evidence (there is no longer a diamond to conduct tests upon and so no possibility of confirming or dis-confirming the statement about the hardness of the diamond) we can form any belief we like about its hardness; it is largely a matter of “verbal disagreement.”

Peirce was to return to this issue in his second major period of work on pragmatism with some regret about this counterintuitive feature of his early pragmatic maxim.

3. Peirce’s Later Pragmatism

After his statement of pragmatism in the 1870’s, Peirce did not fully return to it for around twenty years. Peirce had toyed, throughout the 1890’s, with his ideas on the pragmatic maxim but it was not until James’ California Union Address in 1898 that he felt spurred on to a second major effort at formulating his pragmatism. James publicly named the doctrine of pragmatism and identified Peirce as its founder. Famously, James misremembered seeing the term “pragmatism” in Peirce’s “How to Make Our Ideas Clear”. James was, however, correct in identifying this paper as the first source of pragmatism in Peirce’s work. It was from here that James and other pragmatists, like Schiller, took Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and moved it in new directions.

By the turn of the twentieth century, then, Peirce’s need to re-engage with pragmatism was paramount. First of all, it would provide him an opportunity to use James’ acknowledgment of his work to gain a toehold in the philosophical and academic arena. Also, on a less personal level, Peirce did not wholly approve of the directions in which James and Schiller were taking pragmatism. This led him to rename his own brand of pragmatism “pragmaticism,” claiming that this title was “ugly enough to be safe from kidnappers.” Throughout the first decade of the 1900’s, then, Peirce attempted, in Harvard lectures and a series of articles for The Monist, to develop the theory he had first detailed in the 1870’s.

The most notable difference between Peirce’s later accounts of pragmatism and his earlier approach is his attitude to the question of whether the destroyed diamond was hard. This had a profound affect on the way he formulated the conditional propositions that constitute the pragmatic meaning of a concept, as we shall see. Recall that in his account of the 1870’s, Peirce maintained that since the diamond was not tested, it made no difference if we said that it was hard or soft. In his later formulations of pragmatism, Peirce states that we can definitely know that the destroyed diamond was hard.

The underlying cause of this change of heart is Peirce’s adoption of a more sophisticated approach to the reality of modal notions like necessity and possibility. In the 1870’s, Peirce’s account of possibility and necessity are based on the epistemological facts about believers in relation to some statement containing modal terms. For instance, to say that something is necessary is just to say that we know it must be the case. And to say that something is possible is just to say that we do not know it not to be the case. This reduces the reality of modal notions to facts about speakers and the words they use. In his later work, Peirce took this account and his early attitude to the diamond example to be crass “nominalism” on his part: he had failed to be a realist about possibilities, or “would-bes,” as he called them.

Peirce’s use of “nominalism” requires some explanation. Nominalism is more normally associated with the medieval discussion on the existence of universals. The nominalist position in this debate sought to explain universals in terms of properties of the words or names used (hence “nominalism” from nominalis or belonging to the name) rather than as separately existing forms. Peirce, however, uses “nominalism” to refer to any theory that does not take the real separate existence of laws, generalities, possibilities etc. seriously. His earlier explanation of possibilities or “would-bes” in terms of properties of knowers, then, counts, for him, as “nominalism.” As such, Peirce’s adoption of a realist position on possibility, that is a commitment to possibilities or “would-bes” as independently real, around 1896/97 provided the foundation for a significant change in his pragmatism.

In his later account of pragmatism, Peirce takes subjunctive conditionals, rather than indicative conditionals, to form the list of conditional propositions that constitute the meaning of our concepts. For instance, on the 1878 account, conditional statements generated for propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid” would include, “If litmus paper is dipped into it then it will turn that paper red.” This is an indicative conditional, expressing what will happen. On this account, it does not make sense to say that a diamond will resist abrasive substances if the diamond is destroyed before testing can take place. Peirce’s later formulation, though, offers us conditionals like, “If we were to dip litmus paper into it then that paper would turn red,” for propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid.” This subjunctive formulation, with regards the diamond example, sees statements like “this diamond is hard” generating a list of subjunctive conditionals like “If we were to rub this diamond with most materials then it would not be scratched.” Conditionals like this hold whether we test the diamond for hardness or not. Consequently, Peirce’s later pragmatism formulates the pragmatic meaning of concepts (or statements) in terms of subjunctive conditionals; his earlier account uses indicative conditionals.

A further development in Peirce’s later expression of pragmatism is the extent to which he places the pragmatic maxim within his wider philosophical account. In the 1870’s, Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is a part of his account of inquiry, suggesting and clarifying concepts worthy of exploration. By the turn of the twentieth century, Peirce’s architectonic vision of philosophy was in full construction and the concept of inquiry was part of a much broader structure. Consequently, Peirce sought to find an alternative expression of his pragmatic maxim more sensitive to the position of inquiry within his architectonic schema. Inquiry was now firmly realized as a part of logic (broadly conceived as semiotic), and more importantly, as one of the normative sciences in Peirce’s architectonic classification. Further, logic was to form the basis of a scientific metaphysics. Peirce’s later pragmatism, then, needed to move away from the more “nominalistic” emphasis of his earlier account, which made meaning a matter of actual descriptive accounts of practical experiences and effects. The strongly descriptive formulation of pragmatic meaning from the 1870’s ran counter to Peirce’s later prescriptivist view of inquiry as the self-controlled, scientific pursuit of concrete reasonableness. This further explains Peirce’s adoption of subjunctive conditionals: they are more sensitive to the prescriptivism of inquiry as a part of the architectonic.

Peirce also needed an account of pragmatism more sympathetic to his metaphysics. By the turn of the century, Peirce had come to realize fully the role of metaphysics in his system, and rather than dispose of it as empty theorizing, Peirce felt the need to reconstruct it as a meaningful science. His early account of the pragmatic maxim was strongly empirical and in “How To Make Our Ideas Clear,” Peirce defines “practical effects” as “sensible effects” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. I, p. 132), or “effects [...] upon our senses” (ibid., p. 131). This tying of the meaningful to the observable needs careful statement if it is not to rule out all but the immediate experiences of our senses. Peirce’s earliest characterization runs close to this. However, his later accounts attempt to broaden the notion of experience beyond the directly observable in an attempt to avoid rendering all metaphysics empty.

Peirce draws a distinction between “real” and “ideal” experience. The former is what we would normally think of as experience through the senses. The later involves diagrammatic reasoning, employed by mathematicians for instance. For Peirce, “ideal” experience involves performing transformations and operations upon diagrams, and “experiencing,” or observing, the result. Algebraic equations and the transformations we perform upon them, for instance, count as diagrammatic or “ideal” experiences. Since “ideal” reasoning is, in many ways, just mathematical and deductive experience, we might take Peirce to be doing little more than pre-empting the logical positivist’s allowance of analytic statements as valid sentences; he simply draws the distinction between the empirically observable and the analytic in a different way. However, Peirce is doing more than this.

Peirce’s mature philosophy is infused with his realism about possibility and generality. Both are important for his scientific metaphysics. What he needs is some way of explaining our experience of these things. The ability to reason, deduce, and infer allows us to use laws and habits and identify possible outcomes and, at the same time, take them seriously as real generalities and possibilities. This has an interesting effect on Peirce’s later notion of the pragmatic maxim. By 1903 and the Harvard Lectures on Pragmatism, the notion of practical effects from the earlier formulation had developed. Peirce, now sensitive to his own modal realism and more sophisticated metaphysical requirements, took the pragmatic maxim to “allow any flight of imagination provided this imagination ultimately alights upon a possible practical effect” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 235).

4. The Pragmatic Maxim and the Verification Principle

Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is often compared with the logical positivist’s verification principle of meaning. With a clearer grasp of the pragmatic maxim, particularly in its later, more mature incarnation, it is worth commenting upon this comparison.

There are, indeed, certain similarities between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle. For instance, the verification principle takes a sentence to be meaningful if there exists an experience that confirms or disconfirms it. As such, it shares with the pragmatic maxim an experiential or practical criterion of meaning; for both, a proposition must have some observable effect in the world to be meaningful. Also of interest, is that both purposefully use their criterion of meaning (through experiential effects) to identify “meaningless” statements. For both, a hypothesis with no observable or practical effects is without meaning. What is more, both use this ability to identify meaningless statements to reassess the content of metaphysics and demarcate worthwhile philosophy from areas where no real contribution can be made. For instance, Peirce thinks that his pragmatic philosophy can make no real contribution to areas of practical ethics: Logical positivists either class ethics with metaphysics as disposable, or make it a matter of opinion.

However, once we are aware of how Peirce’s account of pragmatism began to develop, the similarities between the maxim and the verification principle begin to get a little strained. Furthermore, some of the marked differences between the verification principle and all of Peirce’s formulations of the maxim become more prominent. First, although both share a desire to reassess metaphysics, the verificationists wish to render it obsolete; this was never an objective for Peirce. For Peirce, the reassessment of metaphysics involves bestowing upon it a scientific respectability and, although this objective is clearer in his later work, he always intended to retain some form of metaphysical philosophy.

The other crucial difference between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle is the notion of experience. For verificationists, a verifiable experience is a directly observable one, i.e. observable in terms of simple sensory experience. Peirce, on the other hand, particularly with his later formulations of the maxim, has a broader concept of experience. As we have seen, Peirce’s modal realism, or commitment to the reality of “would-bes” characterizes his later accounts. This marks a crucial difference between the two and logical positivist like Carnap would no doubt feel uncomfortable with Peirce’s claims here. Peirce would no doubt think that the logical positivists were too “nominalistic.” Clearly then, Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is not simply a forerunner to the verification principle.

5. General Problems with The Maxim

Although there are clear differences between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle, they are similar enough for Peirce to face some of the same difficulties encountered by Logical Positivists. A general difficulty for the verification principle is how to formulate it in a way that ensures the right kind of sentences count as meaningful. Traditional criticisms of the verification principle include the thought that in some of its formulations, it is too austere. Sentences about the past, unobservable entities like quarks, etc. are meaningless since there are no directly observable experiences that can confirm them. Peirce felt that this austerity towards meaning was an upshot of his early formulations of the pragmatic maxim, ruling out all metaphysics, including the kind that he felt might be respectable enough to count as meaningful. This led to the more generous construal of experience in his later formulations.

However, whether or not Peirce’s later formulations in terms of “possible practical effects” allow too much to count as meaningful is open to debate. For instance, because the formulation of the maxim in terms of possible practical effects, rather than actual or realized effects, seems to shift the focus of the maxim to expectations rather than actions, the body of meaningful sentences arguably becomes too inclusive. If we can show that some hypothesis or statement has some possible practical effect, then the Christian expectation of the second coming of Christ, say, and the avoidance of sin that it results in, seems to count towards the pragmatic meaning of “God is real.” Although Peirce does actually attempt to argue for the existence of God along similar lines, suggesting that “God is real” has the possible practical effect of seeing man’s “self-controlled conduct” increase (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 446), it is not clear that this development of the maxim is entirely healthy. The use of the pragmatic maxim in Peirce’s later work appears to take on metaphysical baggage that had previously been disposed of, allowing what counts as meaningful to run out of control. It seems, then, that the pragmatic maxim, in all of its formulations, struggles to steer a course between the austerity of the early pragmatism, and the laxity of the later more metaphysically tolerant formulations.

One final peculiarity of the pragmatic maxim, in both its early and late formulations, is that all propositions ultimately become future referring. This is fine with most hypotheses like “diamonds are hard” or “vinegar is diluted acetic acid,” since it is their contribution, possible or otherwise, to future experience that matters. However, statements or hypotheses about the past, rather oddly, become focused on their future effects. So, the pragmatic meaning of “John F. Kennedy was assassinated” generates conditionals about our future investigations, checking history books, reading the Warren report, watching TV footage, and asking those who knew him, etc. This feels counterintuitive, since the statement in question, “John F. Kennedy was assassinated,” seems to be about what happened to J.F.K., rather than about our experiences in unearthing support for its truth.

Despite this rather counterintuitive generation of future referring conditionals for hypotheses about the past, it is not clear that it does a great deal of damage to Peirce’s pragmatism. Rather, it is just a quirk of the maxim’s expression of meaning in terms of action or expectations.

6. Peirce and James: Pragmatism and Pragmaticism

One truly interesting issue for Peirce’s pragmatism is the relationship it bears to the work of the pragmatic philosophers that followed him. Peirce’s pragmatism influenced William James, John Dewey, Josiah Royce and F.C.S Schiller to name but a few of his American and British contemporaries. However, the influence upon and contrast with the work of William James is perhaps the most interesting. This is because although Peirce’s maxim and his work in the 1870’s provide the foundation for many early pragmatists, it is James that popularized the pragmatist approach to philosophy and James’ pragmatism that looms large in our common philosophical understanding of the doctrine. Also, because of the role of James as popularizer, it is his development that prompted much of Peirce’s later reevaluation of his own theory. In order to see what is unique and interesting in Peirce’s pragmaticism, then, it is worth emphasizing some of the crucial differences between Peirce and James’ take on pragmatism.

The primary difference between Peirce and James is that the pragmatic maxim in Peirce’s work is a theory of meaning, but in the hands of James, it becomes a theory of truth. This, however, is due to more crucial differences between the two that mean James’ notion of pragmatism far outstretches a simple meaning criterion, and reflects his more fundamental thoughts about philosophy in general. This comes most prominently to the fore in their basic ideas about the place of pragmatism in philosophy as a whole.

Firstly, Peirce and James have different ideas about the philosophical uses to which a pragmatic method should be put. James is famously anti-intellectualist in his philosophy, distrusting the extent to which we can answer all the important human questions with a materialistic and scientific approach to understanding the universe and our place in it. Peirce, on the other hand, particular in his later work, sees the whole of philosophy embedded within a scientific system and the pragmatic maxim centrally embedded in philosophy. The consequence is that James tends to see pragmatism, and his philosophy, as the stepping off point where materialist and purely intellectualist sciences fail to answer our questions about which beliefs are justifiable. Religious and moral questions require a separate criterion of justification, and this is where a pragmatic method determines what difference I take some such belief to have, and why it is reasonable to hold that belief.

For Peirce, philosophy in general, and the pragmatic maxim in particular, should never stray this far from scientific inquiry. The important philosophical questions, and those with which the pragmatic maxim are concerned, remain firmly within the realm of scientific and intellectualist inquiry. As far as Peirce is concerned, the questions to which James is inclined to apply a pragmatic method are largely beyond the realm of fruitful philosophical inquiry. For Peirce pragmatism is strictly within the realms of scientific sensibilities: for James, it begins at the point where our scientific explanations fall short.

These two different outlooks on philosophy and pragmatism underwrite two very different attitudes to the usefulness of pragmatism entirely. Peirce sees pragmatism as a logical principle. The maxim is a tool of analysis designed to make our concepts clear and logically precise. For James, pragmatism is a philosophical outlook. For him, pragmatism is an approach to philosophy that looks towards the consequences of belief, which looks at human action, and moves the whole enterprise of understanding them, away from scientifically founded philosophy. These two different attitudes result in some further interesting features of the two philosophies.

Firstly, James’ pragmatism, in many ways, looks like a total break with traditionalist concerns. For James, pragmatism makes a move away from the philosophies of Kant and Hegel, with their emphasis upon first principles, categories etc. Indeed, the neo-pragmatism of Richard Rorty takes James’ work to be the decisive shift from traditional philosophy to modern concerns. Of course, Peirce’s philosophy retains the architectonic approach with first principles and categories and looks traditionalist as a result. In many ways, it is these features of Peirce’s work that leaves Rorty unconvinced by Peirce’s status as a pragmatist philosopher.

In another respect though, it is James that looks to have remained within the traditionalist mold and Peirce’s pragmatism that looks progressive. James’ particular take on pragmatism looks towards the individual and the effects of belief upon some person or another. Peirce’s pragmatism on the other hand, looks towards experience in general and effects across persons. For Peirce, the establishment of habit across persons and communities is what is interesting about “practical upshots,” not individual action and reaction. The contrast between James’ individualist approach and Peirce’s communalism is interesting. Individualism is characteristic of much of traditional philosophy, particularly since Descartes, and in this respect, James retains much of the baggage of traditional philosophy. Peirce’s communalism, though, has a particular resonance with contemporary attitudes, particularly since the later Wittgenstein.

One final difference in the pragmatisms of Peirce and James, then, are their different attitudes to the reality of modal notions like possibility and necessity. James saw pragmatism as fundamentally “nominalistic.” As such, the reality of possibilities and so on is explained in James’ philosophy in a way similar to that of the early Peirce, i.e. subjective and epistemological. Peirce’s own mature take on modal notions, as we know, is to be a realist about “would-bes.” This makes his pragmatism focus less on actual occurrences and more on potential effects. It also has the further effect of making his pragmatism take the idea of laws and long run habit more seriously; the idea of natural law concerning the “hardness” of diamonds is, after all, part of his explanation of why the destroyed diamond can count as hard.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first wide spread presentation of Peirce’s work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982 —. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al., (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce’s views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2), (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce’s writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries by Nathan Houser.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1878/1992. “How To Make Our Ideas Clear.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.1, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. 124-141.
    • Peirce’s first statement of pragmatism and the source to which James refers as the seminary of his own pragmatism.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1903/1998. “Harvard Lectures on Pragmatism.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2., ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), chs. 10-16.
    • Often difficult later statement of Peirce’s pragmatism. It is here that Peirce tries to expound his own mature views on pragmatism as part of an architectonically embedded logic, dependent upon ethics and aesthetics.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1905/1998. “What Pragmatism Is.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2., ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. 331-345.
    • One of Peirce’s late Monist articles on pragmatism where he publicly distinguishes his “pragmaticism” from the pragmatism of James. The rest of the Monist series, and other work on his “pragmaticism” are reproduced in The Essential Peirce, Vol.2 and are worth looking at.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Gruender, D. 1983. “Pragmatism, Science and Metaphysics.” In The Relevance of Charles Peirce, ed. Eugene Freeman. (La Salle, IL: Monist Library of Philosophy), pp. 271-291.
    • Expands the often-made comparison between Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and the verification principle by comparing Peirce’s and Carnap’s accounts of meaning and science.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1997. “Logical Principles and Philosophical Attitudes: Peirce’s Response to James’ Pragmatism.” In The Cambridge Companion to William James, ed. Ruth Anna Putnam. (New York: Cambridge University Press), pp. 145-165.
    • Interesting, useful and detailed comparison of the work of James and Peirce, emphasizing their different motivations in using pragmatism, with particular emphasis on Peirce’s own understanding of James’ work.
  • Hookway, C.J. 2000. “Avoiding Circularity and Proving Pragmatism.” In Truth, Rationality, and Pragmatism. (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 285-303.
    • A discussion that takes Peirce’s later concerns with the logical status of pragmatism further than we have done here. Hookway details Peirce’s late concern with attempting to “prove” his own pragmatic maxim by discussing the structure that such a proof should take.
  • Houser, N. 1998. “Introduction to The Essential Peirce Vol. 2.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2, ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. xvii-xxxviii.
    • Houser’s introduction and discussion of the papers included in The Essential Peirce Vol. 2, offers a detailed look at the development of Peirce later thoughts on pragmatism. Further, a discussion of Peirce’s efforts to a find a “proof” for his maxim provides useful insight into Peirce’s pragmatism.
  • Misak, C., 1991. Truth and the End of Inquiry. (Oxford: Oxford University Press)
    • In chapter one of this book, Misak discusses the pragmatic maxim at length and investigates its different formulations from early to late, assessing their shortcomings. Of particular interest, is her insistence on the importance of pragmatism to Peirce’s account of truth.

Author Information

Albert Atkin
Email: pip99aka@sheffield.ac.uk
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom