Category Archives: Chinese Philosophy

Gender in Chinese Philosophy

The concept of gender is foundational to the general approach of Chinese thinkers. Yin and yang, core elements of Chinese cosmogony, involve correlative aspects of “dark and light,” “female and male,” and “soft and hard.” These notions, with their deeply-rooted gender connotations, recognize the necessity of interplay between these different forces in generating and carrying forward the world. The major thinkers of China’s first philosophic flourishing—traditionally referred to as the Hundred Schools, c. 500s-200s B.C.E.—inherited and further developed this comprehensively gendered view of the world. These concepts continue to shape contemporary Chinese thought, as well. Historically, the most influential Chinese perspectives on the issue of gender come from what are commonly referred to as Confucian and Daoist traditions of thought, which take somewhat opposing positions. Many texts associated with Confucianism emphasize yang’s dominant, male-related characteristics, whereas those linked to Daoism, especially the Laozi, reverse this view, finding value in yin’s subordinate, female characteristics. However, it should be noted that Chinese thinkers, regardless of their classification as Confucian or Daoist, generally see the opposing qualities of yin and yang as integral parts of a whole that complement one another. Accordingly, the closest word to “gender” in modern Chinese is xingbie, which can be quite literally understood as a difference (bie) of individual nature or tendencies (xing). The word generally, however, refers to the physiological characteristics that then provide the basis for corresponding social identities. The genders, in terms of social roles, are not defined absolutely or theoretically, but rather through the mutually reciprocal, physical, generative relationship between male and female. They are understood correlatively, and determined by their context and dynamic tendencies as they interact with one another. Such traditions within Chinese thought may be applied as resources for contemporary feminist philosophy, albeit not without considerable caution.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Human Tendencies (Nature) and Gender
  3. Gender Cosmology
  4. Gender and Social Order
  5. Family Patterns
  6. Chinese Cultural Resources for Feminism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

There is a debate in contemporary Chinese academic circles about whether or not the idea of “gender” or “gender concepts” actually applies to traditional Chinese thought. Chinese scholars argue about the presence of “male” (xiong) and “female” (ci) characteristics, differences, and relations in the context of ancient Chinese philosophy. Although affirming this interpretation would provide a space for comparative studies with Western traditions, some thinkers believe that doing so distorts traditional Chinese thought.

Zhang Xianglong is a prominent representative of those who think that Chinese philosophy and culture have long been influenced by concepts of gender. For him, Chinese thinking is fundamentally gendered as it takes the interaction between male and female as the basic model for philosophical investigations. He further argues that it is one of the core aspects of mainstream thought in China. Zhang demonstrates that yin and yang strongly connote ideas of female and male, and identifies such gendered thought in works as early as the Zhouyi, or Yijing (Book of Changes), a traditional Chinese divinatory text of uncertain antiquity consisting of hexagrams and their interpretations, as well as throughout the later traditions of Confucianism, Daoism, and Chinese Buddhism. Accordingly, he argues that yin and women have “in principle never been doomed to be inferior” and “discrimination against women in ancient Chinese culture is neither deterministic nor universal” (Zhang 2002:5). Such a claim is dubious, as the dualistic dynamic of yin and yang, while positing both aspects as essential to existence and in this way ontologically equal, has been generally presented as inherently hierarchical. Chen Jiaqi opposes Zhang’s broader position, arguing that yin and yang are not necessarily related to gender. For Chen, yin and yang primarily involve social relationships, political forms, and weighing advantages and disadvantages. He holds that gender characteristics are too abstract to be practically relevant in this context, and do not apply directly to social forms (Chen 2003).

From a historical perspective, Chen’s interpretation is less convincing than Zhang’s. There are numerous Chinese texts where yin and yang are broadly associated with gender. While yang and yin are not exclusively defined as “male” and “female,” and either sex can be considered yin or yang within a given context, in terms of their most general relation to one another, yin references the female and yang the male. For example, the Daoist text known as the Taipingjing (Scripture of Great Peace) records that “the male and female are the root of yin and yang.” The Han dynasty Confucian thinker Dong Zhongshu (195-115 B.C.E.) also writes, “Yin and yang of the heavens and the earth [which together refer to the cosmos] should be male and female, and the male and female should be yin and yang. Thereby, yin and yang can be called male and female, and male and female can be called yin and yang.” These and other texts draw a strong link between yin as female and yang as male. However, it is important to also recognize that gender itself is not as malleable as yin and yang, despite this connection. While gender remains fixed, their coupling with yin and yang is not. This close and complex relationship means yin and yang themselves require examination if their role in Chinese gender theory is to be properly understood.

The original meaning of yin and yang had little to do with gender differences. Some of the earliest uses of yin and yang are found in the Shangshu (Book of Documents). Here, the word yang is employed six times, and five times it denotes the southern side of mountains, which receives the most sunlight. The term yin appears three times in the text, and refers to the shadier northern side of mountains. These examples are characteristic of how yin and yang function throughout Chinese intellectual history; they do not refer to particular objects, but act as correlative categorizations. In most instances yin and yang are used to indicate a specific relationship within a determined context. The way sunshine falls on a mountain is the context, and the difference between the northern and southern sides, where the latter receives more light and warmth, determines their association, which is understood as yin and yang. The terms are thereby an expression of the function of the sun on a particular place, but they do not speak to the actual substance of the objects (the sun or mountain) themselves. The specific traits of the objects can only be designated yin and yang in their functional correlation to one another. Within this matrix, yin things share commonalities when viewed in relation to yang things.

In this way, the early association of yin and yang with gender can be seen as speaking to the relationship between genders, and not to their essential or substantial natures. Yin and yang traits were thus seen as able to accurately describe broad differences between males and females as they interact with one another. Fixing the link between these categorizations, having men be yang in relation to women, who are yin, only works in a highly abstract or broad sense. For example, the Book of Changes states that the emperor is supposed to have six male ministers at the south palace (a yang position) and six wives or concubines at the north palace (a yin position). Like the southern and northern sides of a mountain, men and women are yang and yin in the way they serve the emperor. Social positions are linked to gender and understood through yin and yang. The Liji (Record of Rituals) states that “the male is outside, and the wife inside the home. The sun starts in the east and the moon starts in the west. This is the distinction of yin and yang, the positions of husband and wife.” However, in specific contexts, it is possible for the association to be reversed. For instance, in Dong Zhongshu’s Chunqiu Fanlu (Spring and Autumn Annals), we also find that “the sovereign is yang, the minister is yin; the father is yang, the son is yin.” Here males, such as ministers or sons, can also be considered yin. The entire pattern can be overturned, as well, such as in the relationship between an empress and her male ministers, where the woman is yang and the men are considered yin. However, such a situation was often considered something that should be approached with caution, as it violated natural patterns. For example, Wang Bi (226-249 C.E.), who did not care much for Dong Zhongshu’s cosmological interpretation, still argued that a woman who was too strong was not to be married.

In terms of actual practice, the more generalized and stable affiliation between yin as female and yang as male often won out, as exemplified by Wang’s idea. It was commonly appropriated as an ideological tool for backing the oppression of women, especially after Dong Zhongshu’s theories took hold. Dong, whose version of Confucianism won imperial backing during the Han dynasty, was also responsible for promoting the official establishment of a formal cosmology based on yin and yang, which became quite influential in the Chinese tradition. While he allows for men to be understood as yin and women as yang in certain contexts, overall he sought to limit the scope of such reversals. For Dong, males are dominant, powerful, and moral, and therefore yang. Women, on the other hand, are precisely the opposite—subservient, weak, selfish, and jealous—and best described as yin. As a result, female virtues became largely oriented toward social roles, especially women’s duties as wives (for example, the female virtues of chastity and compliancy). Against this biased intellectual background, oppressive practices were supported and initiated. For instance, the widespread acceptance of concubinage and female foot binding in Chinese social history expressed the inequality between genders.

However, this social inequality did not accurately reflect its culture’s philosophical thought. Most Chinese thinkers were very attentive to the advantageousness of the complementary nature of male and female characteristics. In fact, in many texts considered Confucian that are predominant for two millennia of Chinese thought, the political system and gender roles are integrated (Yang 2013). This integration is based on understanding yin and yang as fundamentally affixed to gender and thereby permeating all aspects of social life. Sinologists such as Joseph Needham have identified a “feminine symbol” in Chinese culture, rooted in the Daoist concentration on yin. Roger Ames and David Hall similarly argue that yin and yang indicate a “difference in emphasis rather than difference in kind” and should be viewed as a whole, and that therefore their relationship can be likened to that of male and female traits (Ames and Hall 1998: 90-96). Overall, while the complementary understanding of yin and yang did not bring about gender equality in traditional Chinese society, it remains a key factor for comprehending Chinese conceptions of gender. As Robin Wang has noted, “on the one hand, yinyang seems to be an intriguing and valuable conceptual resource in ancient Chinese thought for a balanced account of gender equality; on the other hand, no one can deny the fact that the inhumane treatment of women throughout Chinese history has often been rationalized in the name of yinyang” (Wang 2012: xi).

2. Human Tendencies (Nature) and Gender

Gender issues play an important role in the history of Chinese thought. Many thinkers theorized about the significance of gender in a variety of areas. The precondition for this discussion is an interpretation of xing, “nature” or “tendencies.” The idea of “differences of xing” constitutes the modern term for “gender,” xingbie (literally “tendency differences”) making xing central to this discussion. It should be noted that the Chinese understanding of xing, including “human xing,” is closer to “tendency” or “propensity” than traditional Western conceptions of human “nature.” This is mainly because xing is not seen as something static or unchangeable. (It is for this reason that Ames and Hall, in the quote above, highlight the difference between “emphasis” and “kind.”) The way xing is understood greatly contributes to the way arguments about gender unfold.

The term xing first became an important philosophical concept in discussions about humanity and eventually human tendency, or renxing. In terms of its composition, the character xing is made up of a vertical representation of xin, “heart-mind” (the heart was thought to be the organ responsible for both thoughts and feelings/emotions) on the left side. This complements the character sheng, to the right, which can mean “generation,” “grow,” or “give birth to.” In many cases, the way sheng is understood has a significant impact on interpreting xing and gender. As a noun, sheng can mean “natural life,” which gives rise to theories about “original nature” or “foundational tendencies” (benxing). It thereby connotes vital activities and physiological desires or needs. It is in this sense that Mengzi (372-289 B.C.E.) describes human tendencies (renxing) as desiring to eat and have sex. He also says that form and color are natural characteristics, or natural xing. The Record of Rituals similarly comments that food, drink, and relations between men and women are defining human interests. Xunzi  (312-238 B.C.E.), generally regarded as the last great classical Confucian thinker, fundamentally disagreed with Mengzi’s claim that humans naturally tend toward what is good or moral. He did, however, similarly classify xing as the desire for food, warmth, and rest.

Sheng can also be a verb, which gives xing a slightly different connotation. As a verb, sheng indicates creation and growth, and thus supports the suggestion that xing should be understood as human growth through the development of one’s heart-mind, the root, or seat, of human nature or tendencies. The Mengzi expressly refers to this, stating that xing is understood through the heart-mind. This also marks the distinction between humans and animals. A human xing provides specific characteristics and enables a certain orientation for growth that is unique in that it includes a moral dimension. It is in this sense that Mengzi proposes his theory for natural human goodness, a suggestion that Xunzi later rebuts, albeit upon a similar understanding of xing. Texts classified as Daoist, such as the Laozi and Zhuangzi, similarly affirm that xing is what endows beings with their particular virtuousness (though it is not necessarily moral).

It is on the basis of human nature/tendencies that their unique capacity for moral cultivation is given. The Xing Zi Ming Chu (Recipes for Nourishing Life), a 4th century B.C.E. text recovered from the Guodian archaeological site, comments that human beings are defined by the capacity and desire to learn. Natural human tendencies are thereby not simply inherent, they also need to be grown and refined. The Mengzi argues that learning is nothing more than developing and cultivating aspects of one’s own heart-mind. The Xunzi agrees, adding that too much change or purposeful change can bring about falsity—which often results in immoral thoughts, feelings, or actions. These texts agree in their argument that there are certain natural patterns or processes for each thing, and deviating from these is potentially dangerous. Anything “false” or out of accordance with these patterns is likely to be immoral and harmful to oneself and society, so certain restrictions are placed on human practice to promote moral growth. These discussions look at human tendencies as largely shaped in the context of society, and can be taken as a conceptual basis for understanding gender as a natural tendency that is steered through social institutions. For example, when Mengzi is asked why the ancient sage-ruler Shun lied to his parents in order to marry, Mengzi defends Shun as doing the right thing. Explaining that otherwise Shun would have remained a bachelor, Mengzi writes, “The greatest of human relations is that a man and a woman live together.” Thus Mengzi argues that Shun’s moral character was based on proper cultivation of his natural tendencies according to social mores.

One’s individual nature is largely influenced, and to some extent even generated, by one’s cultural surroundings. This also produces physiological properties that account for a wide variety of characteristics that are then reflected in aspects of gender, culture, and social status. Linked to the understanding of yin and yang as functionally codependent categorizations, differences between genders are characterized on the basis of their distinguishing features, and defined correlatively. This means that behavior and identity largely arise within the context of male-female relations. One’s natural tendencies include gender identity as either xiong xing (male tendencies) or ci xing (female tendencies), which one is supposed to cultivate accordingly. Thus there are more physiological and cultural aspects to human tendencies, as well. In these diverse ways, Chinese philosophy emphasizes the difference between males and females, believing that each has their own particular aspects to offer, which are complementary and can be unified to form a harmonious whole (though this does not necessarily imply their equality).

3. Gender Cosmology

The idea of gender as being fundamentally understood through respective dissimilarities (nan nü you bie) is based in the physiological differences between men and women, but also manifests in philosophic thought. In fact, in one of the earliest references to the distinction between men and women, the Record of Rituals asserts:

Once there is a difference between males and females, then there can be love between fathers and sons. Once there is love between fathers and sons, obligations are generated. Once obligations are generated, rituals are made. Once rituals are made, all things can be at ease.

The original difference between genders is—presumably through the generative power of their combination—the foundation for obligations (or morality) and thus ritual (or social moral patterns), which allows finally for harmony in the cosmos as a whole. Through the establishment of the concept that human tendencies are formed and act in line with nature, Chinese gender cosmology applies an analogous generative model of yin and yang to a general understanding of the world.

Another early text, the 3rd century B.C.E. medical compendium Huangdi Neijing (Inner Scripture of the Yellow Emperor), offers one of the most comprehensive definitions of yin and yang:

Yin and yang are the dao (“way”) of the heavens and earth, they provide the model for the net (gangji) of all beings, they are the parents of all change and transformation, and the origin of life and death, and the residence for spirit and insight. To heal illness [one] must seek its root. (Zhang 2002: 41)

Here, yin and yang are taken as a pattern embedded in the existence of all beings, thus providing the foundation for a coherent worldview. This weaves together human beings, nature, and dao (way) in a manner that creates a dynamic wholeness pervaded by and mediated through the interaction of yin and yang. This Chinese cosmological view sees all things, including humans, as borne of both yin and yang and thus naturally integrated with one another. In essence, dao represents the interaction between yin and yang, and it is in this respect that the Laozi tells us that dao is both the source and the model, or pattern, for all things (Laozi 25). More directly, the Laozi comments that all things in turn carry yin and embrace yang (Laozi 42). This shows that through yin and yang and their patterns of interaction dao provides the rhythm of the cosmos. From this perspective the genders also complement and nourish one another, and are even vital to one another.

The idea that the interaction of yin and yang generates the myriad things in existence corresponds to intercourse between male and female as the only means for reproducing life. Therefore, the nature of men and women in Chinese philosophy is not only based on purely physiological characteristics and differences, but is also the embodiment of yin and yang forces in gender. The dao of men and women are linked to the dao of the universe in terms of reproducing life. This is systematically discussed in the Book of Changes, one of China’s most ancient and influential texts. There, eight trigrams are given, which represent eight natural phenomena and can further be combined to form sixty-four hexagrams. These are expressions of the function and movement of yin and yang. They are composed of two contrasting symbols: the yang-yao unbroken horizontal line, and the yin-yao broken horizontal line. Some scholars see these as referring to the male and female genitals respectively. In this sense, the first two hexagrams qian or “heaven” (which is six yang-yaos) and kun or “earth” (six yin-yaos) can be interpreted as representing pure yin and yang. They are also responsible for the formation of general gender stereotypes in Chinese thought. They provide the gateways for change, and are considered, quite literally, the father and mother of all other hexagrams (which equates to all things in the world). The broad system of the Book of Changes attempts to explain every type of change and existence, and is built upon an identification of yin and yang with the sexes as well as their interaction with one another.

According to the “Xici Zhuan” (Commentary on the Appended Phrases) section of the Book of Changes, qian is equated with the heavens, yang, power, and creativity, while kun is identified with the earth, yin, receptivity, and preservation. Their interaction generates all things and events in a way that is similar to the intercourse between males and females, bringing about new life. The Commentary on the Appended Phrases makes the link to gender issues clear by stating that both qian and kun have their own daos (ways) that are responsible for the male and female respectively. The text goes on to discuss the interaction between the two, both cosmologically in terms of the heavens and earth and biologically in terms of the sexes. The conclusion is that their combination and interrelation is responsible for all living things and their changes. The intercourse between genders is a harmonization of yin and yang that is necessary not only for an individual’s well-being, but also for the proper functioning of the cosmos. Interaction between genders is thus the primary mechanism of life, which explains all forms of generation, transformation, and existence.

4. Gender and Social Order

Theoretically, the social order of gender in Chinese thought is broadly formed on the concepts of the heavens and earth and yin and yang. When these notions are applied to the social field, they are likened to the male and female genders. In the aforementioned Commentary on the Appended Phrases, heaven and yang are considered honorable, while the earth and yin are seen as lowly in comparison. Since the former are coupled with qian, which comprises maleness, and the latter with kun, which marks femaleness, these gender roles are valued similarly. The Inner Scripture of the Yellow Emperor says that yang’s maleness is meant for the outside, and yin’s femaleness for the inside. Men, being equated here with yang, are also associated with superiority, motion, and firmness, while women are coupled with yin and so seen as inferior, still, and gentle. Gender cosmology then largely replaced more dynamic views of gender roles with sharply defined unequal relationships, and these were generally echoed throughout the culture. The social order that emerged from this thought saw men as largely in charge of external affairs and superior to women.

The specific operational mode for maintaining this social order and its gender distinctions is li, propriety or ritual. The Record of Rituals focuses much of its discourse on specific rules regarding distinct practices reserved for certain individuals through gender categorization. In this way, wedding ceremonies are the root of propriety. Marriage is especially important because it is politically valuable for establishing and sustaining social order through designated male-female relations. In the Record of Rituals, men and women are asked to observe strict separation in society and uphold the distinction between the outer and inner. (Men being responsible for the family’s “outer” dealings, including legal, economic, and political affairs, and women the “inner” ones, such as familial relations and housework.) Social roles were thereby moralized according to gender. The Record of Rituals also tells us that the rites as a couple begin with gender responsibilities. It states, for example, that when outside the home the husband is supposed to lead the way and that the wife should follow. However, within the home women were supposed to obey men as well, even boys. Before marriage, a girl was expected to listen to her father, and then after marriage to be obedient to her husband, or to their sons if he died. These general guidelines are commonly referred to in other texts as the sancong side or “three obediences and four virtues,” which dominated theories of proper social ordering for most of China’s history.

The four virtues—women’s virtue (fude), women’s speech (fuyan), women’s appearance (furong), and women’s work (fugong)—were expounded on by Ban Zhao (45-120 C.E.) in her book Nüjie (Admonitions for Women). She believed that women should be conservative, humble, and quiet in expressing ritual or filial propriety as their virtue. In the same way, a women’s speech should not be “flowery” or persuasive, but yielding and circumspect. She should also pay close attention to her appearance, be clean and proper, and act especially carefully around guests and in public. Her work consists mainly in household practicalities, such as weaving and food preparation.

The sancong (three obediences) can also be regarded as a forerunner to the san gang, or “three cardinal guides,” of the later Han dynasty (25-220 C.E.). The three cardinal guides were put forward by the aforementioned Dong Zhongshu and contributed greatly to integrating yin and yang gender cosmology into the framework of Confucian ethics. These guides are regulations about relationships—they are defined as the ruler guiding ministers, fathers guiding sons, and husbands guiding wives. Although these rules lack specific content, they do provide a general understanding for ordering society that is concentrated on proper relationships, which is the basic element for morality in many Confucian texts. Here a strong gender bias emerges. The partiality shown toward the elevated position of husbands is only further bolstered by the other two relationships being completely male-based. The only time females are mentioned they are last. Moreover, the ranking of the relationships themselves are hierarchical, relegating women to the lowest level of this order.

Dong also elaborated on distinguishing goodness from evil based on elevating things associated with yang and its general characteristics as ultimately superior to yin, and at the same time emphasized their connections to gender characteristics. This further reinforces deep gender bias. The language of Dong’s Spring and Autumn Annals praises males and presents a negative view of females and all things feminine. The text explicitly argues that even if there are ways in which the husband is inferior to the wife, the former is still yang and therefore better overall. Even more drastically, it states that evilness and all things bad belong to yin, while goodness and all things good are associated with yang, which clearly implicitly links good and evil to male and female, respectively. There are places where, due to the interrelated correlative relationship between yin and yang, the female might be yang and therefore superior in certain aspects, but since she is mostly yin, she is always worse overall. The text even goes so far as to require that relationships between men and women be adjusted to strictly conform to the three cardinal guides. Rules require that subjects obey their rulers, children their fathers, and wives their husbands. In Dong’s other writings, he goes a step further, declaring that the three cardinal guides are a mandate of the heavens. This gives cosmological support to his social arrangement, equating male superiority with the natural ordering of all things.

In the Baihutong (Philosophical Discussions in the White Tiger Hall), which is a collection of court debates from the later Han dynasty, discourse on Dong’s guidelines is taken further. During this time, Confucianism was established as the official state ideology and heavily influenced many areas of politics, including court functioning, policies, and education. This, in turn, provided the foundation for a Confucian society in which this ideology successfully penetrated the daily lives of the state’s entire populace. Dong’s interpretation of ancient texts, including his reading of gender cosmology, became especially powerful as Confucianism believes that the basis for social order and morality begins in human interaction, not individuals. In this context, people are mainly understood according to their roles in society or relationships with others, which were already established as naturally hierarchical in the Analects (the record of Confucius’s actions and words). Dong’s work added a distinct favoring of male over female that became increasingly established and widespread as Confucianism became increasingly influential. Conceived of as analogous to the relationship between rulers and ministers, teachers and students, or parents and children, the two sexes were generally assumed to be a natural ordering of the superior and inferior.

Although these sexist trends are not found in earlier texts—at least not explicitly—they became quite common after the Han dynasty. (The most controversial exception to this is in Analects 17:25, where Confucius is recorded to have equated petty people and women; however, it is unclear exactly what he meant, and whether or not he was referring to women in general or just “petty” ones.) By the Song dynasty (960-1279 C.E.), mainstream political and intellectual discourse viewed both the ability and moral character of women as significantly inferior to males. The Confucian classic known as the Shijing (Book of Poetry) includes the controversial line “Male intellect builds states, female intellect topples states” (Zhou 2002: 489), which in the Song dynasty became understood as an argument for keeping women out of politics and state affairs. On this basis, the Neo-Confucian thinker Zhu Xi  (1130-1200) criticized Wu Zetian, China’s only female emperor, arguing that failure to observe Dong’s three cardinal guides was ultimately responsible for the chaos, violence, and civil wars that had followed the Tang dynasty (618-907 C.E.). Later, during the Ming dynasty (1368-1644 C.E.), the Confucian thinker Zhang Dai (1597-1679 C.E.) developed the idea that males express virtuousness through their ability to debate and contend with one another, while women find virtuousness in lacking this skill. Although he did not expound much on this idea, it was taken to mean that women were both unable and ought not contend with others, including their husband. Their obedience was a display of morality. Similarly, men were expected to dominate their wives in a somewhat disrespectful manner in order to display their own ethical cultivation. In more extreme interpretations, Zhang’s notion was read as “a woman without talent is virtuous.” This was linked to the cosmological understanding of gender roles so that failure to follow these guides meant the betrayal of natural patterns—the traditional foundation for ethical norms. During this time, imperial law stated that any man over forty without a male heir must take on a concubine to aid him in producing one.

The domination of these views in both culture and philosophy caused the Chinese tradition to attach great importance to hierarchical gender roles. Social order based itself on cosmological theories that were automatically normative and constituted guidelines for moral cultivation. Despite the Book of Changes and Laozi’s emphasis on the importance of the interaction between yin and yang as complementary and mutually constitutive, women were generally regarded as inferior.

5. Family Patterns

Ideal political and social order in the state was regarded as a replication of the family model on a larger scale. The way neighbors interacted, friends treated one another, and ministers served rulers were all based on models of familial relationships. Early Confucian texts provided the ideological foundation for this pattern by arguing that morality must be cultivated at home first before it could be adequately practiced in society. In terms of gender, the hierarchical relationships in socio-political spheres were simply extensions of the superiority of husbands in spousal relations. The Record of Rituals explains, “Just as two rulers cannot coexist in one country, a household cannot have two masters; only one can govern” (Zheng 2008: 2353). Dong Zhongshu’s three cardinal guides promoted this attitude by requiring that wives listen to their husbands in the same way that children should listen to fathers and then further placing the spousal relationship below that of father and son. Zhu Xi bolstered this order by arguing that children should respect both parents, but that the father should be absolutely superior to the mother. Zhu recognized that there were aspects of life, mostly household affairs (nei), that women were well suited for, but saw men’s duties as superior, and therefore advocated that males always dominate females.

In line with the mutual relationship of yin and yang emphasized by the Book of Changes and Daoism, marriages were largely understood as being a deferential equivalence. The wedding rites in the Record of Rituals say that marriages are important for maintaining ancestral sacrifice and family lineages. The text describes that when a groom gives a salute, the bride can sit, and that during the ceremony they should eat at the same table and drink from the same bottle to display their mutual affection, trust, and support. This also aligns the woman, who had no official rank of her own, with her husband’s rank. The Record of Rituals further records that during China’s first dynasties, enlightened monarchs respected their wives and children, and that this is in line with natural order or dao. The Xiaojing (Classic of Filial Piety) also says that rulers should never insult even their concubines, let alone their wives. Although only leaders are mentioned, according to Chinese ethical systems people are supposed to emanate their superiors, so this deference would ideally be practiced in every household. However, such roles were largely based on function. For men this meant learning, working, and carrying on the ancestral line. Women were in charge of household affairs and principally responsible for producing a male heir. If they failed in the latter, their martial function was largely unfulfilled, which reflected poorly on the husband, as well. Since the women’s function was largely mechanistic, her status was much lower and she was essentially anonymous, without independent social standing. Men could take on concubines to produce heirs or simply for pleasure, and while wives were “in charge” of concubines, they could also be (albeit rarely) replaced by them, and would have to serve the sons of concubines if they produced none of their own. Legally, men owned their wives, and there was often little practical recourse for a woman against her husband, even though the laws of certain periods allowed for it.

The Book of Poetry contains a large number of poems and songs describing marriage and love between men and women, some of which express the joys and sorrows of women. The collection includes lamentations of men going off on business or to war, and women’s complaints of being abandoned by their husbands after concubines are purchased. They are meant to remind husbands of social expectations and moral responsibilities. The Lienüzhuan (Biographies of Virtuous Women) and Xunzi both argue that the husband-wife relation is foundational for the family, and therefore for a stable society, as well. (The Zhongyong, or Doctrine of the Mean, adds that the sage’s virtue is found most simply in husband-wife relations.) Liu Xiang (77 B.C.E.-6 C.E.), the complier of the Lienüzhuan, firmly believed that morality starts in the family and reverberates out into society. He grouped virtuous women into six categories, or virtues: maternal rectitude (muyi), sage-like intelligence (xianming), humane wisdom (renzhi), purity and deference (zhenshun), chastity and dutifulness (jieyi), and skill in arguments and communication (biantong). Later editions of this text became less gender specific, but Liu emphasized women who were able to carry out certain female-related duties in role-specific conditions (including those of daughter, wife, daughter-in-law, and mother). Although Liu did not mention it, later texts argued that widows should not remarry or take on lovers. The Neo-Confucian thinker Cheng Yi  (1033-1107) was one of the harshest interpreters of widow fidelity, claiming that they should rather starve to death than take on a second husband. Zhu Xi, who disagreed with Cheng on many issues, argued that this was not practical; yet it was generally regarded as virtuous, even if not widely practiced. Cheng’s proposal was also important because he did not restrict such devotion to women, which created a rare sense of equality (of which Zhu also disapproved).

Analogous to yin and yang, the relationship of the wife and “inner” with the husband and “outer” is conceived of as complementary, not dualistic. According to the functional distinction of “inner” and “outer,” women were responsible for everything in the house, while men dominated external affairs. The most basic form of this division was given as “Men plow and women weave” (nan geng nü zhi). However, this distinction is not equivalent to the Western concepts of private and public. In fact, during the Wei-Jin period of national disunity (265-420 C.E.), it was common for women in northern Chinese states to handle family legal matters at court, go out to present gifts, and handle certain business matters. The woman’s role was not always marginalized, but it was focused on specific tasks. Chinese families often believed that educating their daughters well (though not necessarily in literary learning) was the precondition for improving the family and encouraging orderliness. Women were also often the primary caretakers and to some extent educators of all children, male or female—an invaluable role for the entire household. A couple’s shared goals, like obtaining wealth or educating children, were designated into separate spheres that either the wife or husband would control. The third-century B.C.E. philosophical miscellany known as Lüshi Chunqiu (Mr. Lü’s Spring and Autumn Annals) declares that husbands should have clothes to wear without weaving and wives have food to eat without farming because of their division of labor, which allows for a more efficacious family and society. Individual differences should be acknowledged so that the couple can support and assist one another.

6. Chinese Cultural Resources for Feminism

Taking yin and yang as an analogy for female and male, classical Chinese thought presents a complex picture of their interaction. Firstly, with thinkers such as Dong Zhongshu, the split between the two genders can be seen as relatively fixed. On this basis regulations on gender roles are equally stabilized, so that they are considered complementary, but not equal. The second major trend, seen most explicitly in the Laozi, values the inseparability of yin and yang, which is equated with the female and male. This interpretation explores the productive and efficacious nature of yin, or feminine powers. While not necessarily feminist, this latter view provides a robust resource for exploring feminism in Chinese thought. These two orientations were developed along the lines of their respective representatives in Chinese traditions.

Like the relationship between yin and yang, a complementary relationship can be seen between these two views on gender. Thinkers such as Confucius, Mengzi, Xunzi, Dong Zhongshu, and Zhu Xi are often taken to represent Confucianism, which belongs to the first viewpoint. The Laozi and Zhuangzi have then been seen as opposed to these thinkers, and are representative of Daoism. However, the actual relationship between these two “schools” is much more integrated. For example, Wang Bi wrote what is generally regarded as the standard commentary on the Laozi, and yet he considered Confucius to be a higher sage than Laozi. Similarly, actual Chinese social practices cannot be traced back to either Daoism or Confucianism exclusively, though one or the other may be more emphasized in particular cases. Taken as separate, they each highlight different aspects that, when integrated with one another, represent a whole. Although they are sometimes read as opposing views, both are equally indispensable for comprehending Chinese culture and history.

Despite the possibility of reading feminism into many Chinese texts, there can be no doubt that the Chinese tradition, as practiced, was largely sexist. For the most part, the inferior position of women was based on readings (whether or not they were misinterpretations) of texts generally classified as Confucian, such as the Record of Rituals, Book of Poetry, or Analects. On the other hand, other texts regarded as Confucian—such as the Book of Changes or Classic of Filial Piety—harbor rich resources for feminism in China. So while sexist practices are and were frequently defended on the basis of Confucian texts, this is limited to particular passages, and does not speak to the complexity of either Confucianism or Chinese traditions in general.

As a response to dominant practices, the Laozi—regardless of whether it was formed earlier or later than other major texts, such as the Analects—favors notions that counter (but do not necessarily oppose) early social values. While the Record of Rituals and Book of Poetry contain or promote hierarchical interpretations of gender issues, the Laozi clearly promotes nominally feminine characteristics and values. (This puts the Laozi in conflict with some branches of feminism that seek to destroy notions of “female” or gender-oriented traits and tendencies.) While this does not necessarily equate the Laozi with what is now called “feminism,” it does provide Chinese culture with a potential resource for reviving or creating conceptions of  femininity in a more positive light.

The major philosophical concept in the Laozi is dao (way). The first chapter of the text claims that the unchanging dao cannot be spoken of, but it does offer clues in the form of a variety of images that appear throughout its eighty-one chapters. Several of the descriptions associate dao with the feminine, maternal, or female “gate.” In this context, dao is given three important connotations. It is responsible for the origin of all things, it is all things, and it provides the patterns that they should follow. The comparison to a woman’s body and its function of generation (sheng) identify dao as feminine, and therefore speak to the power of the female. The Laozi can therefore be read as advocating that female powers and positions are superior to their male counterparts. In modern scholarship, this is frequently noted, and several scholars have attempted to use the Laozi to support Chinese and comparative feminist studies. Images in the text strongly support these investigations.

For example, the text speaks of the gushen, the “spirit of the valley,” which is said to “never die” and is called xuanpin, or “mysterious femininity” (ch. 6). The character for “spirit,” gu, originally meant “generation.” It is identified with sheng (part of the character for gender and tendencies), and its shape is sometimes taken to represent the female genitals. In other places, dao is referred to as the mother and said to have given birth to all things (ch. 52). Contemporary scholars also point out that there are no “male” images or traditionally male traits linked to dao in the Laozi. Dao’s characteristics, such as being “low,” “soft,” and “weak,” are all associated with yin and femininity, thereby forging a strong link between dao and the female.

Yin tendencies are not, however, exclusively valued. The Laozi offers a more balanced view, which is why it can be used as a resource of feminism, but is not necessarily feminist itself. For example, it says that all things come from dao and that they carry the yin and embrace the yang, and that their blending is what produces harmony in the world (ch. 42). Yin is arguably more basic, but is prized for its ability to overcome yang, just as the soft can overcome the hard and stillness can defeat movement. These notions are applied to many aspects of life, including sexual, political, and military examples. These examples revere female traits, arguing that yin should be acknowledged for its numerous strengths, but do not reject the importance of yang.

Taken as a political text, the Laozi argues that the ruler should take on more female than male traits in order to properly govern the world. This is supposed to allow him to remain “still” while others are in motion, ideally self-ordering. Although this confirms the usefulness of female virtue, it is not an argument for it being superior, or even equal to male counterparts. Rather, it demonstrates how female characteristics can be used to promote efficacy.

Given that sexist practices have largely be defended by reference to texts and scholars that self-identify with the Confucian tradition, it is easy to see why contemporary scholars have looked to the Laozi as one of the major sources for constructing Chinese feminism. It is certainly the first major Chinese philosophical text that explicitly promotes a variety of female traits and values, which allows room for feminist consciousness and discourse.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger T., and David L. Hall. Thinking from the Han: Self, Truth, and Transcendence in Chinese and Western Culture. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1998.
    • (This book includes a chapter on gender roles that outlines how the Confucian tradition can be used to establish a foundation for Chinese gender equality.)
  • Ames, Roger T., and Henry Rosemont Jr., trans. The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation. New York, NY: Ballantine Books, 1998.
    • (An excellent translation of the Confucian Analects.)
  • Bossler, Beverly. Courtesans, Concubines and the Cult of Female Fidelity: Gender and Social Change in China, 1000–1400. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2012.
    • (A superb study of how female roles and virtues shaped Chinese family life, politics,and academics.)
  • Chen, Jiaqi. “Critique of Zhang Xianglong.” Zhejiang Academic Journal 4 (2003): 127–130.
    • (This article points out inequalities of gender rules in Chinese philosophy and social systems.)
  • Moeller, Hans-Georg, trans. Daodejing: A Complete Translation and Commentary. Chicago, IL: Open Court, 2007.
    • (Moeller’s commentary is sensitive to feminist interpretations of the Daodejing or Laozi.)
  • Rosenlee, Li-Hsiang. Confucianism and Women. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2006.
    • (A book-length study of gender roles in the Confucian tradition.)
  • Van Norden, Bryan, trans. Mengzi, with Selections from Traditional Commentaries. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2008.
    • (A masterful translation of the Mengzi with commentaries from traditional Chinese scholars.)
  • Wang, Robin R. Yinyang: The Way of Heaven and Earth in Chinese Thought and Culture. NY: Cambridge University Press, 2012.
    • (The best study of Chinese yinyang theory in English. The text also includes discussions of gender issues.)
  • Wang, Robin R. Images of Women in Chinese Thought and Culture: Writings from the Pre-Qin Period through the Song Dynasty. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2003.
    • (An excellent resource for gender issues in Chinese thought.)


Author Information

Lijuan Shen
Xi’an University of Architecture and Technology


Paul D’Ambrosio
East China Normal University

Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang, 1877—1969)

Zhang JunmaiZhang Junmai (Chang Chun-mai, 1877-1969), also known as Carsun Chang, was an important twentieth-century Chinese thinker and a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Zhang’s participation in “The Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923, in which he defended his Neo-Confucian views against those of Chinese progressives and scientists, made a strong philosophical impression on an entire generation of Chinese intellectuals by championing the value of traditional Confucian truth claims and asserting the limits of scientific knowledge.  Subsequently, Zhang’s two-volume study of The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought (1957) and his Manifesto for the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958) cemented his identification with Confucianism, and the view of Confucianism as compatible with modernity, in the English-speaking philosophical world. Despite his association with Confucianism, Zhang was deeply influenced by the work of the French thinker Henri Bergson and exponents of German Idealism, particularly Immanuel Kant and Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel. Zhang is best known today, however, not for his original philosophical work but rather for his political activities during China’s Republican era (1912-1949), through which he and his “Third Force” party attempted to mediate between the polarized Nationalist and Communist factions in the Chinese political landscape, as well as his promotion of Neo-Confucian studies in the West. His personal motto was, “Do not forget philosophy because of politics, and do not forget politics because of philosophy.” Due perhaps to his acknowledgment of Western influences as well as his involvement in politics, Zhang remains one of the modern Confucian movement’s most understudied figures, especially in comparison to his contemporaries Feng Youlan and Mou Zongsan. Yet his dual participation in both philosophy and politics makes him an exemplary Confucian and an embodiment of the Neo-Confucian ideal of “the unity of knowledge and action” (zhixing heyi).

Table of Contents

  1. Early Life
  2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity
  5. Influence and Key Interpreters
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Studies

1. Early Life

The man known as Zhang Junmai was born Zhang Jiasen, son of a merchant family in the Jiading district of China’s Jiangsu Province, on January 18, 1887. His early education included the memorization of the Four Books and Five Classics of traditional Confucianism.  At the age of eleven, however, his forward-thinking family sent him to study Western history and science as well as the English language, although he continued to read the work of influential Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Zhu Xi. At the age of fifteen, he passed the district-level civil service examination and earned the basic shengyuan or xiucai degree, which entitled its bearers to exemption from corvée labor and corporal punishments and granted them access to local government facilities.  After continuing his studies for a few more years, Zhang taught English in Hunan Province for two years before traveling to Tōkyō, Japan in 1906 and enrolling in Waseda University’s undergraduate program in economics and political science. Like many other Chinese intellectuals of that era, he intended to take advantage of Japan’s recent and rapid modernization by studying Western thought while remaining within an East Asian cultural context.

In Japan, Zhang befriended the constitutional monarchist Liang Qichao (1873-1929), a political reformer whose activities led to his exile in 1898.  Zhang began to publish articles in Liang’s biweekly, New Citizen (Xinmin Congbao), including translations of excerpts from John Stuart Mill’s Considerations on Representative Government. Zhang’s other activities within expatriate Chinese circles included participation in the creation of the Political Information Society (Zhengwen she), which competed with Sun Yat-sen’s United League (Tongmeng hui) for the hearts and minds of reform-minded Chinese of the period. After graduating from Waseda in 1911, he returned to China and successfully passed the entrance examination for the Hanlin Academy, a prestigious Confucian college founded in the eighth century. However, the Hanlin Academy, like other official Confucian institutions, soon fell victim to the Chinese Revolution, which swept away this and other vestiges of imperial rule in favor of a more democratic and scientifically-minded “New China.” Unable to pursue his dream of becoming a government official, Zhang returned to his ancestral home, where he was appointed chairman of the local parliament. Soon afterward, Zhang’s publication of an article critical of government policy toward Mongolia led to his proscription, and he fled to Germany to avoid repression.

In Germany, as in Japan, Zhang once more pursued academic studies, registering at the University of Berlin for preparatory coursework that would lead to enrollment in the University’s doctoral program in law and political science. World events disrupted his plans yet again when the First World War broke out in 1914. Zhang turned his attention to the ongoing conflict, publishing articles in about the European political and military situations in Chinese newspapers. In 1915, Zhang traveled to England before returning to China one year later to assume the editorship of the newspaper New Current Affairs (Shishi xinbao) and teach law at Beijing University. With the conclusion of hostilities in 1919, Zhang toured Europe in the company of Liang Qichao and other Chinese intellectuals and attempted to intervene in the transfer of sovereignty over China’s Shandong Province (the home region of Confucius) from Germany to Japan by the Peace Conference of Versailles that ended the war. Having recently produced a Chinese translation of the American president Woodrow Wilson’s “Fourteen Points,” which justified the Allies’ use of force in the name of democracy and national self-determination, Zhang was devastated and rapidly lost interest in politics, turning his attention “from social sciences to philosophy,” as he later called this crucial transition in his life.

In January 1921, Zhang met with Rudolf Eucken (1846–1926) in Jena, Germany. This encounter was perhaps one of the most important turning points in Zhang’s life. After a brief interview, Zhang decided to stay in Jena to learn philosophy under Eucken’s patronage. Studying with Eucken opened Zhang’s mind to new sets of ideas, especially those of Henri Bergson (1859-1941), and questions of life, ethics and culture gained a more important place in his thought. In 1922, Zhang collaborated with Eucken in the writing of a book in German entitled Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa (The Problem of Human Life in China and Europe). The first half of the book, written by Eucken, was a short introduction to the history of European conceptions of life, while the second half, written by Zhang, dealt with the outlooks on life found in the work of major Chinese philosophers. Although Zhang’s treatment of Chinese thought was mainly historical in perspective, this text marks the first occasion on which he drew parallels between Confucian traditions and the philosophy of Kant. Here, Zhang argued that Confucius’ dictum that “what the superior man seeks is in himself, while what the petty man seeks is in others” (Analects 15:21) was comparable to Kant’s claim that the sources of morality are to be found within oneself. Thus, in Zhang’s view, both Confucianism and Kantianism see human morality as grounded in human nature and thus autonomous.

Despite Zhang’s immersion in philosophical studies, he remained active in politics. During his time in Germany, he met with many activists and leaders, including the social democrat Philip Scheidemann (1865–1939) and the architect of Germany’s post-war constitution, Hugo Preuss (1860–1925). These encounters with Weimar Republic intellectuals helped to form Zhang’s conceptions of socialism and exerted a lasting influence on his dual life in politics and philosophy. Both aspects of this dual life were expressed in his participation in “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923.

2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics

Having returned to China, in February 1923 Zhang gave a speech at Beijing’s Qinghua School (later Qinghua University) about the differences between science and what he called “outlooks on life” (rensheng guan). In this speech, Zhang claimed that the former is characterized by “objectivity,” “logic,” “analytic methods,” “causality,” and “uniform phenomena,” while the latter are “subjective,” “intuitive,” and “synthetic,” based on “free will.” Moreover, he defended the idea that, in her path to modernization, China should not only consider the sciences but also ought to define a new way, based on the “outlooks on life” of ancient Chinese sages. Zhang’s position drew considerable criticism from intellectuals associated with the anti-traditional May Fourth Movement, especially the famous geologist Ding Wenjiang (1887–1936). The difference of opinion between Zhang and Ding developed into a major political and philosophical event in the intellectual history of Republican China and became known as “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists.” This debate played an important role in the emergence of a neo-conservative trend in modern Chinese thought by raising the questions of what place science ought to have in modern Chinese society and whether scientism and positivism ought to influence modern Chinese worldviews.  The debate also played an important role in the development of Zhang’s philosophy insofar as it prompted the first publication of Zhang’s philosophical views in Chinese.

By 1923, Zhang’s conception of himself as a “realist idealist” (weishi de weixin zhuyi)—one who refused to sacrifice empirical issues for the sake of his deeply-held ideals—was fully established. Because of Zhang’s attraction to the thought of Bergson and Eucken, he was often criticized as an “anti-rationalist” (fan lixing zhuyi zhe). What his critics appear to have had in mind was not an opposition to reason on Zhang’s part, but rather his concern to avoid the over-use of the “process of abstraction” (chouxiang licheng). On Zhang’s view, when considering abstractions such as “Humanity” or “Nature,” one should always keep in mind that they are real and in front of us. Instead of building abstract systems and concepts, Zhang wanted to construct a philosophy that would embrace the reality and the fullness of the universe.

Zhang founded his “realist idealist” philosophy on the basis of a classically dualistic conception of the world. On the one hand, there is matter (wuzhi or wu); on the other hand, there is spirit (jingshen) or mind (xin). Zhang rejected monistic conceptions of the world as incoherent, going so far as to translate the English philosopher C. E. M. Joad’s Mind and Matter, which advocated the same position, in 1926. Zhang’s dichotomy between mind and matter is a structural division in his philosophy, which generates a series of opposing notions: matter is outside (wai) of the self and is fixed (ding), while mind or spirit is always inside (nei) the self and in motion (dong). The material world of nature is governed by causality, while the spiritual world of humanity is conducted by free will (ziyou yizhi). In later years, when discussing the relation between liberty (ziyou) and power (quanli) in political philosophy, Zhang categorized the former as belonging to the realm of spirit and the latter as relative to matter. His division between science and “outlooks on life” thus is an extension of these binary oppositions that are basic to his thought.

Zhang regarded science (kexue) as a plural signifier and subdivided it into two types: “material sciences” (wuzhi kexue) and “spiritual sciences” (jingshen kexue). This opposition was based on the German distinction between “natural sciences” (Naturwissenschaften or Exactewissenchaften) and “spiritual sciences” (Geistwissenchaften). While his opponents advocated science as one universal epistemology based on specific methodology, Zhang argued that one should consider sciences according to their objects, which could be any of three types: “inert” (si zhi wu), “alive” (huo zhi wu), or “alive and thinking” (youhuo yousi zhi wu). Incapable of moving by themselves, inert objects are bound to follow the rules of causality. Their movements can be explained by natural laws, and it is the purpose of material sciences to discover and analyze these laws. For instance, astronomy aims at explaining how planets gravitate around the sun. On Zhang’s account, physics and astronomy are the most archetypal material sciences.

Although plants and animals lack “mind” in Zhang’s sense, they are alive nonetheless, so for Zhang, their analysis raises further issues.  Unlike inert objects, plants and animals can move on their own, so despite the fact that causality applies to them, it doesn’t explain everything. But Zhang insisted that the presence of life in itself couldn’t be questioned by science. Following the ideas of the German vitalist Hans Driesch (1867–1941)—who was at that time visiting in China, where Zhang served as his translator—Zhang seems to believe that there is an entelechy, a driving principle that directs life and its development without being part of the soul or the organism, the existence of which precludes questioning its manifestation. To Zhang, the very foundations of life were completely impossible to analyze. Therefore, biology was not literally “the science of what is alive” but only the science that analyzes the material structure and development of living animals and plants

As for what Zhang called “spiritual sciences”—by which he meant something like social sciences—these moved beyond the realm of matter and were capable of analyzing humanity itself. Yet all the natural laws that could be found in those sciences were always linked to a material aspect of life. For instance, Zhang accepted that there were laws of development in economy; economy and society were at some point to follow specific patterns. But he insisted that these laws could only be found because there are material and fixed data to analyze. Economics, for example, deals with manufactured goods. On Zhang’s account, spiritual sciences could discover and analyze laws of nature only if their object was somehow linked to something material. Even if there are laws that condition the development of social phenomena, human beings still can use their minds and free will to modify the situation. For that reason, social laws or historical patterns can only be sought in the past.  Following Bergson, Zhang noted that the human spirit is in perpetual transformation (xin zhi wanbian): it is impossible to divide thought into fixed mental states, as our minds are always on the move (dong). Having no place to settle, no analysis can be made. Therefore, for Zhang, there cannot be any real psychology, but only physiology, a study of the relation between stimuli and the mind. According to Zhang, science cannot predict the future of humanity, which is why he rejected Marxism.

In contrast to such “sciences,” Zhang outlined his understanding of “outlooks on life” as a coherent alternative to claiming that everything could be understood and controlled by Science. In her fight for a new culture (xin wenhua), China was to cast away naturalism and positivism, and develop a new “outlook on life,” based on both Western modernity and the teachings of the ancient Chinese sages, that did not exclude or condemn metaphysics. Zhang even claimed that the introduction of Bergson’s and Eucken’s philosophies to China could give birth to “Neo-Song [Dynasty] Learning” (xin songxue 新宋學), just as the introduction of Buddhism to China had permitted the emergence of the original Neo-Confucianism of the Song dynasty (songxue).

In Eucken’s philosophy, humanity is a being at the frontier of matter and spirit, and is in a perpetual struggle to achieve a spiritual life that can overcome his material nature. By promoting metaphysics, Zhang wished to foster human spiritual life and dismiss a scientistic conception of the world that would bind human beings in the web of material causality.   Borrowing from Eucken’s Die Lebenschauungen der grossen denker (Outlooks on Life of the Great Thinkers, 1890), Zhang defined “outlook on life” as follows:

The observations, holds, hopes, and demands that I have toward the persons and the objects external to myself—that’s what I call an outlook on life. (Zhang 1981, p. 935)

Outlooks on life are not under the control of sciences. They find their source in the self (wo). Considering that “toward the world, man’s life is inner as spirit and outer as matter” (ibid.), outlooks on life are in fact what link our spiritual life with the material world. Even if people of the past can be models to follow (Zhang 1981, p. 913), everyone ought to develop his own outlook on life according to what his heart-mind (xin) tells him. That is what Zhang called the mandate of moral conscience (liangxin zhi ming). For Zhang as for other Confucians, the heart-mind is the center of the self; every moral thought and volition is generated from it. Having three principal functions, knowledge (zhi 智), emotions (qing 情) and will (zhi 志), it is what makes us human. In total opposition to the view defended by Hu Shi (1891-1962) at that time, Zhang argued that the difference between humans and animals is qualitative, not quantitative. The use of such concepts and terminology shows how deep the influence of Mencius’ and Wang Yangming’s moral thought on Zhang was. As a thinker who was steeped in Confucian tradition, Zhang considered human beings to be good by nature and wanted to promote Neo-Confucian metaphysics as a means to cultivate oneself (xiushen).

Finally, a word should be said about Zhang’s debt to Kant, which was the result of his lifelong infatuation with this eighteenth-century German thinker. Zhang’s epistemology was mainly drawn from Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason (1781); he considered Kant to be the man who “had succeeded in harmonizing British empiricism and German rationalism” (Zhang 1981, p. 949). For Zhang, knowledge is the result of an encounter between material sense information and the innate categories of the mind. Human beings have innate categories or “concepts of reason” (lixing zhi gainian) that enable them to understand, classify, and aggregate all of their sensations (ganjue). It is these concepts of reason that link sensations to meanings (yiyi). Later, Zhang suggested that knowledge, built up from the encounter of sensations and concepts of reason, is always internal to one’s mind. For instance, in 1957, he wrote that the Song dynasty Confucian thinker Ch’eng I’s statement ”Human nature is reason” [(xing ji li ye], “means nothing other than the rationalist doctrine that forms of thought exist a priori in the mind” (Chang 1957, p. 35). For Zhang, the key philosophical question was that of the relationship between a mind able of knowing (zhizhi zhi xin) and the myriad things (wanwu zhi you) or phenomenal universe, through which knowledge of all that exists, materially and spiritually, could be integrated. Assuming that the principle of mind (xin li) is universal, Zhang anticipated that the development of thought ought to be somehow similar in every culture. This argument would form the basis of his claim that a genuine Chinese modernity was possible.

3. Political Philosophy

Despite Zhang’s leap “from social sciences to philosophy,” he did not abandon political life.    On the contrary, he participated in the drafting of a new Chinese constitution and wrote

On the Meaning of Constitutions (1921).  He struggled to introduce socialism in China. Very much taken with the newly-established Weimar Republic in Germany, Zhang wished to establish a very similar political system in China. In 1923, he opened a “Political Institute” in the suburbs of Shanghai, the aim of which was to form a new political elite that would be able to shape the nation’s affairs in future years. Under its auspices, Chinese students were exposed to political philosophy, economics, sociology, and international relations as well as Zhang’s critiques of both the Chinese Communist Party and the Guomindang (Kuomintang, KMT) or Chinese Nationalist Party, which contended against each other for political and later military supremacy throughout the 1920s, ’30s, and ’40s. After the KMT occupation of Shanghai in 1927, Zhang was forced to close the Institute and ventured into underground political activities. With Li Huang (1895—1991), a leader of the Chinese Youth Party (Zhongguo qingnian dang), he illegally published a journal, The New Way (Xinlu), in which he proclaimed his political values:

 [D]emocratic government, opposition to both one-class and one-party dictatorships, freedom of speech and association, opposition to the denial of these basic human rights under the pretext of party or military rule, the opposition to party control of education, of judicial affairs, of civil servants, and the use of the army for personal or party purposes. (Chi, p. 141)

These points can be regarded as the key ideas of Zhang’s political thought at the time. In opposition to nationalist and communist conceptions of the political power in China, Zhang totally forbade the political parties to indoctrinate their members, to use military force or to practice dictatorial politics—all of which may have prevented Zhang’s own political parties from ever succeeding in the brutal political climate of China during the 1930s. Frustrated by chronic repression at the hands of the KMT, Zhang fled China once again and returned to Germany, where he obtained a position as Professor of Chinese Philosophy at the University of Jena through the assistance of Eucken’s former students. Eventually, he returned to China just before Japanese invasion of Manchuria in September 1931. In this politically-charged and highly unstable climate, Zhang assumed professorial duties in philosophy at Yanjing University in Beijing, teaching mostly about Hegel, before being ejected from his position as a result of his critical stance vis-a-vis the KMT government. Siding with the warlord Chen Jitang, the de facto ruler of Guangdong Province, Zhang again found work as a professor of philosophy, this time teaching Neo-Confucianism—first at Sun Yat-sen University and later at his own Learning Ocean Academy (Xuehai Shuyuan).

At this institution, which blended traditional Confucian education with what Zhang saw as the best of Western learning (humanities, social sciences, and physical education), he was able to put into practice what he had defended during the debate of 1923: an education that would place equal and shared emphasis on the humanities (especially metaphysics), the arts, sports, and of course the sciences. In 1939, Zhang opened another such school: the Institute of National Culture (Minzu Wenhua Xueyuan), the guiding documents of which stated:

The objectives of this academy are as follows: one, to achieve one’s personality; two, to temper and foster intelligence in order to contribute to the world scholarship; three, to deploy these activities, in which moral and knowledge are one, to participate grandly in the ordering of the world (or statecraft). (Zhang 1981, p. 1435)

To participate in the world, either as politicians or as scholars, students were first to develop their personality. For Zhang, such psychological development, along with physical ability and intellectual knowledge, were all necessary to become a full human being. Self-cultivation through education, in turn, was key to the development of Chinese democracy, which was Zhang’s primary political commitment. In his political philosophy, there is a very strong bond between the people and the idea of the State. Democracy should not be implemented from above, but rather it should arise from the heart-minds of citizens. Influenced by Confucian ethics, Zhang appears to have viewed democracy through the prism of the canonical Confucian text known as the Daxue (Great Learning), which states:

To bring the world at peace, one should first govern one’s State; to govern one’s State, one should first order one’s family; to order one’s family, one should first cultivate oneself.

Zhang believed that the Chinese people would permit the emergence of democracy as the result of their own self-cultivation. For him, the State was no longer understood as a simple technical term of political science. It was the realization of the spirit of a people, founded on the basis of law and morality. Borrowing the Hegelian idea that “State is the realization of the Spirit [or Reason]” (guojia zhe jingshen zhi shixian ye), Zhang linked the question of the State with a certain humanism and a valorization of Chinese culture. The emergence of a new political system was to be the result of a New Culture (xin wenhua), from which would emerge a new outlook on life. Unfortunately, Zhang’s academies never stayed open very long. The Ocean Learning Academy was active for only two years, while the Institute of National Culture was closed in 1942, after three years of operation.

4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity

As was the case with Zhang’s moral metaphysics and political philosophy, so also in his understanding of culture did Zhang cleave closely to his Confucian heritage. His philosophy of culture upheld a certain conservatism, according to which both Chinese cultural unity and Chinese social development could proceed organically from a shared basis in Neo-Confucian thought. In The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936), which can be regarded as a response to Liang Shuming’s Eastern and Western Cultures and Their Philosophies (1921), Zhang defended this view:

Spiritual freedom [jingshen ziyou] is the foundation of a national culture [minzu wenhua] and therefore it should be the central principle to direct the politics, the sciences and the arts of China from now on. (Zhang 2006b, p. 1)

Zhang argued that a culture is a spiritual entity that is created by, and evolved through, the free contributions of its people—not a static expression of an ahistorical will, as Liang claimed. The nation is in fact the group of persons that build a cultural unity and live together within it. The influence of the Western philosophers of history Oswald Spengler (1880-1936) and Arnold Toynbee (1889-1975) can be seen in Zhang’s view. Zhang understood European modernity to be the result of a threefold historical process, which consisted of (1) religious reform (zongjiao gaige), (2) scientific development (kexue fazhan), and (3) the emergence of democratic government (minzhu zhengzhi). The challenge for China, therefore, lay not with importing European modernity, but rather with completing its own historical process of development in evolutionary terms specific to Chinese culture.

Like many Chinese intellectuals of the early twentieth century, Zhang advocated the need for a “New Culture”; like his rival Liang, Zhang believed that Chinese culture would become the global culture of the future. However, Zhang believed that this “New Culture” would develop only in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the West, just as Neo-Confucianism had developed in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the introduction of Buddhism from India—an historical event to which Zhang repeatedly referred as a positive precedent for China’s ability to adapt to foreign systems of thought. As “the culture of harmony,” Chinese culture would find the middle way (zhezhong) between all global philosophical and cultural trends—but only if she initiated the first step in the threefold historical process by rediscovering and reviving the “Chinese national spirit” (Zhonghua minzu jingshen), which Zhang identified with Neo-Confucianism. After China revived the quintessence of her past culture—that is, Neo-Confucianism as interpreted by Zhang—she would be able to formulate a new outlook on life, which in turn would give birth to a new culture. From this new culture, a new political system and a new economic organization soon would follow.

However, unlike many Chinese intellectuals of the era who defended a racial conception of the nation, Zhang had no interest in the question of blood lineage. As he pointed out in The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936) and The Way to Establish the State (1938), one could not find any racial unity in China; since various “barbarian” invasions had produced a “blood mix” in the population, the blood of the Han ethnic majority was no longer “pure.”  Constructing a blood-based nationalism would be irrelevant and self-destructive, but constructing a culture-based nationalism was another matter:

I won’t dare say that in History there was such a thing as a pure blood Han nation, however I can attest that there is a Han Culture, which embodies the language spoken, the characters used, the calendar, the customs, the rites and so on. (Zhang 2006d, p. 9)

Zhang’s activity as a non-aligned political thinker was curtailed by the end of cooperation between the KMT and the Chinese Communist Party in 1941, and he was placed under house arrest because of his opposition to KMT policies. In 1944, he was released and traveled to the United States, where he attended the founding meeting of the United Stations. While in the United States, Zhang renewed his interest in constitutionalism and spent much of his time studying the American Constitution. After returning to China in 1946, he began to argue that a conception of human rights, or at least its seeds, could be found in the Chinese intellectual tradition, especially in the thought of Mencius. His work became the basis of the Constitution of the Republic of China adopted in 1946, which is still in effect in Taiwan today. The implementation of the Constitution failed to resolve China’s ongoing civil war, however, and with the triumph of Communist forces in 1949, Zhang fled to a life of exile in Hong Kong.

In Hong Kong, Zhang produced The Third Force in China and initiated the modern Chinese discourse on democracy’s roots in Chinese tradition. Having identified elements of democratic sensibilities in ancient Chinese texts, Zhang held out hope that the establishment of democracy in China still was possible despite the victory of Communism on the mainland.  He even suggested that the Enlightenment and the development of democratic ideas in the West during the eighteenth century were made possible due to the introduction of Confucian thought to Europe by Jesuit missionaries a century earlier. Thus, in Zhang’s view, Confucius and Mencius were the hidden sources of the West’s Enlightenment. Moreover, Zhang regarded Marxism as being in total opposition to the “Chinese outlook on life,” and anticipated the eventual decline of Communist ideology in China. In 1957 and 1962, he issued in English the two volumes of his magnum opus on the intellectual history of China, The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought, which opens with the following sentence:

China is the land of Confucianism. (Chang 1957, p.15)

In Zhang’s biographically-focused and comparatively-oriented account of Neo-Confucianism, rooted in his conception of “outlooks on life” in the East and the West, he criticized Communism as an alien system of thought that would not take root in Chinese culture, which he believed was characterized by Confucianism despite the influence of other traditions. Identifying himself as a twentieth century “Neo-Confucian,” Zhang continued to advocate what he saw as a genuine Chinese Confucian modernity until his death at age eighty-two in the United States in 1969, which also marked the height of the Communists’ “Cultural Revolution” campaign against Confucianism and other emblems of Chinese tradition.

5. Influence and Key Interpreters

Zhang’s involvement in the production of A Manifesto on the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958), a document that aimed to promote an appreciation of Chinese culture among Western intellectuals, marks him as one of the key influences on the modern “New Confucian” movement, which seeks to promote Confucianism as a spiritual tradition that is fully compatible with democracy, science, and other aspects of modernity. Zhang’s participation in this movement probably stands as his foremost legacy in the world of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Despite Zhang’s stature as a founder of New Confucianism and a promoter of Neo-Confucian studies in the West, he is little studied today, especially by Western scholars. Most Western research on Zhang’s thought has focused on his political philosophy and activism—an approach exemplified by the work of Roger B. Jeans (1997). Studies that depart from this rule include those of Umberto Bresciani (2001) and Edmund S.K. Fung (2003). German scholars have taken a particular interest in the ways in which Zhang’s work might apply to resolving modern problems, such as the deterioration of social relationships and the spiritual vacuum perceived in contemporary societies. Werner Messner (1994) has devoted attention to the tension between the process of modernization and the will to find a specific way (Sonderweg) for China in the thought of modern Chinese philosophers, especially Zhang.

Unsurprisingly, interest in Zhang’s work has been greater in the Chinese-speaking world, especially outside of mainland China. Zhang’s friends and associates produced much of the early scholarship on his thought. Xue Huayuan’s 1993 study of Zhang’s political activity ranks with Jeans’ work among the major research on Zhang produced to date. Within mainland China, for many years Zhang’s thought was proscribed because his idealist views and “bourgeois” background. Even after studies of Zhang by mainland Chinese scholars began to appear in the 1990s, many—such as those by Lü Xichen and Chen Ying (1996)—were harshly critical of his shortcomings as seen from a Marxist perspective. More recently, Zheng Dahua (1997, 1999) has produced more sympathetic scholarship on Zhang’s thought, while Chai Wenhua (2004) has explored Zhang’s conception of culture in particular. Most recently, Weng Hekai’s work (2010) focuses on Zhang’s contributions to the question of Chinese nation-building, especially the influence of John Stuart Mill to Zhang’s thinking about this issue. As interest in Zhang’s special concerns, such as Chinese cultural unity, constitutionalism, and an authentically Chinese modernity, intensifies in contemporary China, interest in Zhang’s legacy is sure to increase there and elsewhere.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

  • Chang, Carsun.  The Third Force in China, New York: Bookman Associates, 1952.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucian thought. 2 vols. New York: Bookman Associates, 1957-1962.
  • Chang, Carsun. Wang Yang-ming: Idealist Philosopher of Sixteenth-Century China. Jamaica, NY: St.  John’s University Press, 1962.
  • Chang, Carsun, and Rudolf Eucken. Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa, Leipzig: Quelle & Meyer, 1922.
  • Chang, Carsun, and Kalidas Nag.  China and Gandhian India. Calcutta: The Book Company, 1956.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Guoxian yi (1921). In Xian Zheng zhi dao (Beijing: Qianghua daxue chubanshe, 2006a).
  • Zhang, Junmai. Minzu fuxing de xueshu jichu (1935). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006b.
  • Zhang, Junmai.  Mingri zhi Zhongguo wenhua (1936). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006c.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Li guo zhi dao (1938). In Xian Zheng zhi dao (Beijing: Qianghua daxue chubanshe, 2006d).
  • Zhang, Junmai. Yili xue shi jiang gangyao (1955). Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Bijiao Zhong Ri Yangming xue. Taibei: Taiwan shangwu yinshu guan, 1955.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Bianzheng weiwu zhuyi bolun. Hong Kong: Youlian chubanshe, 1958.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Zhongguo zhuanzhi junzhu zhengzhi pingyi. Taibei: Hongwen guan chubanshe, 1986.
  • Zhang, Junmai. Rujia zhexue zhi fuxing. Beijing: Zhongguo renmin daxue chubanshe, 2006.
  • Zhang, Junmai, and Wenxi Cheng. Zhong Xi Yin zhexue wenji. 2 vols. Taibei: Taiwan xuesheng shuju, 1970.
  • Zhang, Junmai, and Huayuan Xue. Yijiusijiu nian yihou Zhang Junmai yanlun ji. Taibei : Daoxiang chubanshe, 1989.

b. Secondary Studies

  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Chai, Wenhua. Xiandai xin ruxue wenhua guan yanjiu. Beijing: Xinhua shudian, 2004.
  • Chen, Huifen. “Minzu xing, Shidai xing, Zizhu xing: 1930 niandai Zhang Junmai de wenhua jueze.” Taiwan shida lishi xuebao 28 (June 2000): 109–158.
  • Chen, Xianchu. Jingshen ziyou yu minzu fuxing – Zhang Junmai sixiang zonglun. Changsha: Hunan Jiaoyu chubanshe, 1999.
  • Chi, Wen-shun. Ideological conflicts in Modern China: Democracy and Authoritarianism.  New Brunswick: Transaction Books, 1986.
  • Fang, Shiduo, ed. Zhang Junmai zhuanji ziliao. 8 vols. Taibei: Tianyi, 1979-1981.
  • Frohlich, Thomas. Staatsdenken im China der Republikzeit (1912–1949): Die Instrumentalisierung philosophischer Ideen bei chinesischen Intellektuellen. Frankfurt: Campus Verlag, 2000.
  • Fung, Edmund S.K. “New Confucianism and Chinese Democratization: The Thought and Predicament of Zhang Junmai.” Twentieth Century China 28/2 (April 2003): 41-71.
  • He, Xinquan (Ho Hsin-Chuan). “Zhang Junmai de Xinruxue qimeng jihua : yi ge xiandai vs. Houxiandai shidu.” Taiwan dongya wenming yanjiu xuekan 8/1/15 (July 2011): 209-234.
  • Hung, Mao-hsiung. Carsun Chang (1887–1969) und seine Vorstellung vom Sozialismus in China.  Ph.D. diss.  Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität, 1980.
  • Jeans, Roger B. Syncretism in Defense of Confucianism: An Intellectual and Political Biography of Early Years of Chang Chünmai, 1887-1923. Ph.D. diss., George Washington University, 1974.
  • Jeans, Roger B. Democracy and socialism in Republican China: the politics of Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang), 1906-1941.  Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1997.
  • Jiang, Yongzhen. “Zhang Junmai.”  In Shounan Wang, ed., Zhongguo lidai sixiang jia (Taipei: Taiwan shangwu yinshu guan faxing, 1987), 10: 6230-6352.
  • Liu, Yilin, and Qingfeng Luo. Zhang Junmai pinglun. Nanchang: Bai hua zhou wenyi chubanshe, 1996.
  • Lü, Xichen, and Ying Chen. Xin ruxue: Zhang Junmai sixiang yanjiu. Tianjin: Tianjin renmin chubanshe, 1996.
  • Meissner, Werner. China zwischen nationalem “Sonderweg”, und universaler Modernisierung – Zur Rezeption westlichen Denkens in China.  Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag, 1994.
  • Peterson, Kent McLean. A Political Biography of Zhang Junmai, 1887-1949. Ph.D. diss., Princeton University, 1999.
  • Tan, Chester C.  Chinese Political Thought in the 20th Century. Melbourne: Wren Pub., 1972.
  • Weng, Hekai. Xiandai Zhongguo de Ziyou minzu zhuyi: Zhang Junmai Minzu jianguo sixiang pingzhuan. Beijing: Falü chubanshe, 2010.
  • Xu, Jilin. Wuqiong de kunhuo: Huang Yanpei, Zhang Junmai yu xiandai Zhongguo. Shanghai: Sanlian shudian, 1998.
  • Xue, Huayuan. Minzhu xianzheng yu minzu zhuyi de bianzheng fazhan: Zhang Junmai sixiang yanjiu.  Taibei: Daohe chubanshe, 1993.
  • Yang, Yongqian. Zhonghua minguo xianfa zhi fu: Zhang Junmai zhuanji. Taibei: Tangshan, 1993.
  • Ye, Qizhong (Yap Key-chong). “Cong Zhang Junmai he Ding Wenjiang liang ren he Renshengguan yi wen kan 1923 nian ‘Ke Xuan lunzhan’ de baofa yu kuozhan.”  Zhongyang yanjiu yuan jindai shi yanjiu shuo jikan 25 (June 1996): 211-267.
  • Zhang, Rulun. “Zhongguo xiandai sixiang shang de Zhang Junmai.” In Jilin Xu, ed., Ershi Shiji Zhongguo sixiang shi lun (Shanghai: Dongfang chuban zhongxin, 2000), 2:124-153.
  • Zheng, Dahua. Zhang Junmai zhuan. Beijing: Zhonghua shuju, 1997.
  • Zheng, Dahua. Zhang Junmai xueshu sixiang pingzhuan. Beijing: Beijing Tushuguan chubanshe, 1999a.
  • Zheng Dahua. Liangqi qicai – Mingren bixia de Zhang Junmai. Shanghai: Dongfang chuban zhongxin, 1999b.
  • Zheng, Jiadong. Xiandai xin rujia gailun. Nanning: Guangxi renmin chubanshe, 1990.


Author Information

Joseph Ciaudo
Institute of Eastern Languages and Civilizations

Mou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) (1909—1995)

Mou ZongsanMou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) is a sophisticated and systematic example of a modern Chinese philosopher. A Chinese nationalist, he aimed to reinvigorate traditional Chinese philosophy through an encounter with Western (and especially German) philosophy and to restore it to a position of prestige in the world. In particular, he engaged closely with Immanuel Kant’s three Critiques and attempted to show, pace Kant, that human beings possess intellectual intuition, a supra-sensible mode of knowledge that Kant reserved to God alone. He assimilated this notion of intellectual intuition to ideas found in Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism and attempted to expand it into a metaphysical system that would establish the objectivity of moral values and the possibility of sagehood.

Mou’s Collected Works run to thirty-three volumes and extend to history of philosophy, logic, epistemology, ontology, metaethics, philosophy of history, and political philosophy.  His corpus is an unusual hybrid in that although its main aim is to erect a metaphysical system, many of the books where Mou pursues that end consist largely of cultural criticism or histories of Confucian, Buddhist, or Daoist philosophy in which Mou explains his own opinions through exegesis of other thinkers’ in a terminology appropriated from Kant, Tiantai Buddhism, and Neo-Confucianism.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Cultural Thought
    1. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation
    2. Development of Chinese Philosophy
    3. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism
  3. Metaphysical Thought
    1. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves
    2. Two-Level Ontology
    3. Perfect Teaching
  4. Criticisms
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Mou was born in 1909, at the very end of China’s imperial era, into the family of a rural innkeeper who admired Chinese classical learning, which the young Mou came to share. At just that time, however, traditional Chinese learning was being denigrated by some of the intellectual elite, who searched frantically for something to replace it due to fears that their own tradition was dangerously impotent against modern nation-states armed with Western science, technology, bureaucracy, and finance.

In 1929, Mou enrolled in Peking (Beijing) University’s department of philosophy. He embarked on a deep study of Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica (then a subject of great interest in Chinese philosophical circles ) and also of Whitehead’s Process and Reality. However, Mou was also led by his interest in Whiteheadian process thought to read voraciously in the pre-modern literature on the Yijing (I Ching or Book of Changes), and his classical tastes made him an oddball at Peking University, which was vigorously modernist and anti-traditional.  Mou would have been a lonely figure there had he not met Xiong Shili in his junior year. Xiong was just making his name as a nationally known apologist for traditional Chinese philosophy and mentored Mou for years afterward.   The two men remained close until Mou later left the mainland. Mou graduated from Peking University in 1933 and moved around the country unhappily from one short-term teaching job to another owing to frequent workplace personality conflicts and fighting between the Chinese government and both Japanese and Communist forces. Despite these peregrinations, Mou wrote copiously on logic and epistemology and also on the Yijing.  Mou hated the Communists very boisterously and when they took over China in 1949 he moved to Taiwan and spent the next decade teaching and writing in a philosophical vein about the history and future of Chinese political thought and culture. In 1960, once again unhappy with his colleagues, Mou was invited by his friend Tang Junyi, also a student of Xiong, to leave Taiwan for academic employment in Hong Kong.  There, Mou’s work took a decisive turn and entered what he later considered its mature stage, yielding the books which established him as a key figure in modern Chinese philosophy. During the next thirty-five years he published seven major monographs (one running to three volumes), together with translations of all three of Immanuel Kant’s Critiques and many more volumes’ worth of articles, lectures, and occasional writings. Mou officially retired from the Chinese University of Hong Kong in 1974 but continued to teach and lecture in Hong Kong and Taiwan until his death in 1995.

We can divide Mou’s expansive thought into two closely related parts which we might call his “cultural” thought, about the history and destiny of Chinese culture, and his “metaphysical” thought, concerning the problems and doctrines of Chinese philosophy, which Mou thought of as the essence of Chinese culture.

2. Cultural Thought

a. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation

Like most intellectuals of his generation, Mou was a nationalist and saw his work as a way to strengthen the Chinese nation and return it to a place of greatness in the world.

Influenced by Hegel, Mou thought of the history and culture of the Chinese nation as an organic whole,, with a natural and knowable course of development. He thought that China’s political destiny depended ultimately on its philosophy, and in turn blamed China’s conquest by the Manchus in 1644, and again by the Communists in 1949, on its loss of focus on the Neo-Confucianism of the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644)He hoped his own work would help to re-kindle China’s commitment to Confucianism and thereby help defeat Communism.

Along with many of his contemporaries, Mou was interested in why China never gave rise its own Scientific Revolution like that in the West, and also in articulating what the strengths were in China’s intellectual history whereby it outstripped the West. Mou phrased his answer to these two questions in terms of “inner sagehood” (neisheng) and “outer kingship” (waiwang). By “inner sagehood,” Mou meant the cultivation of moral conduct and outlook—at which he thought Confucianism was unequalled in the world—and he used “outer kingship” to encompass political governancealong with other ingredients in the welfare of society, such as a productive economy and scientific and technological know-how. Mou thought that China’s classical tradition was historically weak in the theory and practice of “outer kingship,” and he believed that Chinese culture would have to transform itself thoroughly by discovering in its indigenous learning the resources with which to develop traditions of science and democracy.

For the last thirty years of his life, all of Mou’s writings were part of a conversation with Immanuel Kant, whom he considered the greatest Western philosopher and the one most useful for exploring Confucian “moral metaphysics.” Throughout that half of his career, Mou’s books quoted Kant extensively (sometimes for pages at a time) and appropriated Kantian terms into the service of his reconstructed Confucianism. Scholars agree widely that Mou altered the meanings of these terms significantly when he moved them from Kant’s system into his own, but opinions vary about just how conscious Mou was that he had done so.

b. Development of Chinese Philosophy

As an apologist for Chinese philosophy, Mou was anxious to show that its genius extended to almost all areas and epochs of Chinese philosophy. To this end, He wrote extensively about the history of Chinese philosophy and highlighted the important contributions of Daoist and Buddhist philosophy, along with their harmonious interaction with Confucian philosophy in the dialectical unfolding and refinement of Chinese philosophy in each age.

Before China was united under the Qin dynasty (221-206 BCE), Mou believed, Chinese culture gave definitive form to the ancient philosophical inheritance of the late Zhou dynasty (771-221 BCE), culminating in the teachings of Confucius and Mencius. These were still epigrammatic rather systematic, but Mou thought that they already contained the essence of later Chinese philosophy in germinal form. The next great phase of development came in the Wei-Jin period (265-420 CE) with the assimilation of “Neo-Daoism” or xuanxue (literally “dark” or “mysterious learning”), from whence came the first formal articulation of the “perfect teaching” (concerning which see below). Shortly afterward, Mou taught, Chinese culture experienced its first great challenge from abroad, in the form of Buddhist philosophy. In the Sui and Tang dynasties (589-907) it was the task of Chinese philosophy to “digest” or absorb Buddhist philosophy into itself. In the process, it gave birth to indigenous Chinese schools of Buddhist philosophy (most notably Huayan and Tiantai), which Mou believed advanced beyond the Indian schools because they agreed with essential tenets of native Chinese philosophy, such as the teaching that all people are endowed with an innately sagely nature.

On Mou’s account, in the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644) Confucianism underwent a second great phase of development and reasserted itself as the true and proper leader of Chinese culture and philosophy. However, at the end of the Ming, there occurred what Mou taught was an alien irruption into Chinese history by the Manchus, who thwarted the “natural” course of China’s cultural unfolding. In the thinking of late Ming philosophers such as Huang Zongxi (1610-1695), Gu Yanwu (1613-1682), and Wang Fuzhi (1619-1692), Mou thought that China had been poised to give rise to its own new forms of “outer kingship” which would have eventuated in an indigenous birth of science and democracy in China, enabling China to compete with the modern West. Chinese culture, however. was diverted from that healthy course of development by the intrusion of the Manchus. Mou believed that it was this diversion which made China vulnerable to the Communist takeover of the 20th century by alienating it from its own philosophical tradition.

Mou preached that the mission of modern Chinese philosophy was to achieve a mutually beneficial conciliation with Western philosophy. Inspired by the West’s example, China would appropriate science and democracy into its native tradition, and the West in turn would benefit from China’s unparalleled expertise in “inner sagehood,” typified especially by its “perfect teaching.”

However, throughout Mou’s lifetime, he remained unimpressed with the actual state of contemporary Chinese philosophy. He seldom rated any contemporary Chinese thinkers as worthy of the name “philosopher,” and he mentioned Chinese Marxist thought only rarely and only as a force entirely antipathetic to true Chinese philosophy.

c. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism

In his historical writings on Confucianism, Mou is most famous for his thesis of the “three lineages” (san xi). Whereas Neo-Confucians where traditionally grouped into a “School of Principle” represented chiefly by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and a “School of Mind” associated with Lu Xiangshan (1139-1192) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529), Mou also recognized a third lineage exemplified by lesser-known figures as Hu Hong (Hu Wufeng) (1105-1161) and Liu Jishan (Liu Zongzhou) (1578-1645).

Mou judged this third lineage to be the true representatives of Confucian orthodoxy. He criticized Zhu Xi, conventionally regarded as the authoritative synthesizer of Neo-Confucian doctrine, as a usurper who despite good intentions depicted heavenly principle (tianli) in an excessively transcendent way that was foreign to the ancient Confucian message. On Mou’s view, that message is one of paradoxical “immanent transcendence” (neizai chaoyue), in which heavenly principle and human nature are only lexically distinct from each other, not substantially separate. It was because Mou believed that the Hu-Liu lineage of Neo-Confucianism expressed this paradoxical relationship most accurately and artfully that that he ranked it the highest or “perfect” (yuan) expression of Confucian philosophy. (See “Perfect Teaching” below.)

Because Mou wanted to revalorize the whole Chinese philosophical tradition, and not just its Confucian wing, he also wrote extensively on Chinese Buddhist philosophy. He maintained that Indian Buddhist philosophy had remained limited and flawed until in migrated to Chinawhere it was leavened with what Mou saw as core principles of indigenous Chinese philosophy, such as a belief in the basic goodness of both human nature and the world. From Chinese Buddhist thought he adopted methodological ideas that he later applied to his own system. One of these was “doctrinal classification” (panjiao), a doxographic technique of reading competing philosophical systems as forming a dialectical progression of closer and closer approximations to a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao), rather than as mutually incompatible contenders. Much as Mou discovered what he thought of as the highest expression of Confucian doctrine in the largely forgotten thinkers of the Hu-Liu lineage, he found what he thought of as their formal analog and philosophical precursor in the relatively obscure Tiantai school of Buddhism and its thesis of the identity of enlightenment and delusion.

Mou wrote far less about Daoism than Confucianism or Buddhism, but at least in principle he regarded it too as an indispensible part of the Chinese philosophical heritage. Mou focused most on the “Inner Chapters” (neipian) of the Zhuangzi, especially the “Wandering Beyond” (Xiaoyao you) and “Discussion on Smoothing Things Out”(Qi wu lun) and the writings of Wei-Jin commentators Guo Xiang (c. 252-312 CE) and Wang Bi (226-249 CE). Mou saw the Wei-Jin idea of “root and traces” (ji ben) in particular as an early forerunner of Tiantai Buddhist thinking central to its concept of the “perfect teaching.”

3. Metaphysical Thought

In his metaphysical writings, Mou was mainly interested in how moral value is able to exist and how people are able to know it. Mou hoped to show that humans can directly know moral value and indeed that such knowledge amounts to knowledge par excellence. In an inversion of one of Kant’s terms, he called this project “moral metaphysics” (daode de xingshangxue), meaning a metaphysics in which moral value is ontically primary. That is, a moral metaphysics considers that the central ontological fact is that moral value exists and is known or “intuited” by us more directly than anything else. Mou believed that Chinese philosophy alone has generated the necessary insights for constructing such a moral metaphysics, whereas Kant (who represented for Mou the summit of Western philosophy) did not understand moral knowing because, fixated on theoretical and speculative knowledge, he wrong-headedly applied the same transcendentalism that Mou found so masterful in the Critique of Pure Reason (which supposes that we know a thing not directly but only through the distorting lenses of our mental apparatus) to moral matters, where it is completely out of place.

a. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves

For many, the most striking thing about Mou’s philosophy (and the hardest to accept) is his conviction that human beings possess “intellectual intuition” (zhi de zhijue), a direct knowledge of reality without resort to the senses and without overlaying such sensory forms and cognitive categories as time, space, number, and cause and effect.

As with most of the terms that Mou borrowed from Kant, he attached a much different meaning to ‘intellectual intuition.’   For Kant, intellectual intuition was a capacity belonging to God alone. However, Mou thought this was Kant’s greatest mistake and concluded that one of the great contributions of Chinese philosophy to the world was a unanimous belief that humans have intellectual intuition. In the context of Chinese philosophy he took ‘intellectual intuition’ as an umbrella term for the various Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist concepts of a supra-mundane sort of knowing that, when perfected, makes its possessor a sage or a buddha.

On Mou’s analysis, though Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist philosophers call intellectual intuition by different names and theorize it differently, they agree that it is available to everyone, that it transcends subject-object duality, and that it is higher than, and prior to, the dualistic knowledge which comes through the “sensible intuition” of seeing and hearingoften called “empirical” (jingyan) or “grasping” (zhi) knowledge in Mou’s terminology. However, Mou taught that the Confucian understanding of intellectual intuition (referred to by a variety of names such as ren, “benevolence,” or liangzhi, “innate moral knowing”) is superior to the Buddhist and Daoist conceptions because it recognizes that intellectual intuition is essentially moral and creative.

Mou thought that people regularly manifest intellectual intuition in everyday life in the form of morally correct impulses and behaviors. To use the classic Mencian example, if we see a child about to fall down a well, we immediately feel alarm. For Mou, this sudden upsurge of concern is an occurrence of intellectual intuition, spontaneous and uncaused. Furthermore, Mou endorsed what he saw as the Confucian doctrine that it is this essentially moral intellectual intuition that “creates” or “gives birth to the ten thousand things” (chuangsheng wanwu) by conferring on them moral value.

b. Two-Level Ontology

Through our capacity for intellectual intuition, Mou taught, human beings are “finite yet infinite” (youxian er wuxian). He accepted Kant’s system as a good analysis of our finite aspect, which is to say our experience as beings who are limited in space and time and also in understanding, but he also thought that in our exercise of intellectual intuition we transcend our finitude as well.

Accordingly, Mou went to great pains to explain how the world of sensible objects and the realm of noumenal objects, or objects of intellectual intuition, are related to each other in a “two-level ontology” (liangceng cunyoulun) inspired by the Chinese Buddhist text The Awakening of Faith. In this model, all of reality is said to consist of mind, but a mind which has two aspects (yixin ermen). As intellectual intuition, mind directly knows things-in-themselves, without mediation by forms and categories and without the illusion that things-in-themselves are truly separate from mind. This upper level of the two-level ontology is what Mou labels “ontology without grasping” (wuzhi cunyoulun), once again choosing a term of Buddhist inspiration. However, mind also submits itself to forms and categories in a process that Mou calls “self-negation” (ziwo kanxian). Mind at this lower level, which Mou terms the “cognitive mind” (renzhi xin), employs sensory intuition and associated cognitive processes to apprehend things as discrete objects, separate from each other and from mindhaving location in time and space, numerical identity, and causal and other relations. This lower ontological level is what Mou calls “ontology with grasping” (zhi de cunyoulun).

c. Perfect Teaching

On Mou’s view, all of the many types of Chinese philosophy he studied taught some version of this doctrine of intellectual intuition, things-in-themselves, and phenomena, and he considered it important to explain how he adjudicated among these many broadly similar strains of philosophy. To that end, he borrowed from Chinese Buddhist scholasticism the concept of a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao) and the practice of classifying teachings (panjiao) doxographically in order to rank them from less to more “perfect” or complete.

A perfect teaching, in Mou’s sense of the term, is distinguished from a penultimate one not by its content (which is the same in either case) but by its rhetorical form. Specifically, a perfect teaching is couched in the form of a paradox (guijue). In Mou’s opinion, all good examples of Chinese philosophy acknowledge the commonsense difference between subject and object but also teach that we can transcend that difference through the exercise of intellectual intuition. But what distinguishes a perfect teaching is that it makes a show of flatly asserting, in a way supposed to surprise the listener, that subject and object are simply identical to one another, without qualification.

Mou developed this formal concept of a perfect teaching from the example offered by Tiantai Buddhist philosophyHe then applied it to the history of Confucian thoughtidentifying what he thought of as a Confucian equivalent to the Tiantai perfect teaching in the writings of Cheng Hao (1032-1085), Hu Hong, and Liu Jishan. Though Mou believed that all three families of Confucian philosophy—Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist—had their own versions of a perfect teaching, he rated the Confucian perfect teaching more highly than the Buddhist or Daoist ones, for it gives an account of the “morally creative” character of intellectual intuition, which he thought essential. In the Confucian perfect teaching, he taught, intellectual intuition is said to “morally create” the cosmos in the sense that it gives order to chaos by making moral judgments and thereby endowing everything in existence with moral significance.

Mou claimed that the perfect teaching was a unique feature of Chinese philosophy and reckoned this a valuable contribution to world philosophy because, in his opinion, only a perfect teaching supplied an answer to what he called the problem of the “summum bonum” (yuanshan) or “coincidence of virtue and happiness” (defu yizhi), that is, the problem of how it can be assured that a person of virtue will necessarily be rewarded with happiness. He noted that in Kant’s philosophy (and, in his opinion, throughout the rest of Western philosophy too) there could be no such assurance that virtue would be crowned with happiness except to hope that God would make it so in the afterlife. By contrast, Mou was proud to say, Chinese philosophy provides for this “coincidence of virtue and happiness” without having to posit either a God or an afterlife. The argument for that assurance differed in Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist versions of the perfect teaching, but in each case it consisted of a doctrine that intellectual intuition (equivalent to “virtue”) necessarily entails the existence of the phenomenal world (which Mou construed as the meaning of “happiness”), without being contingent on God’s intervention in this world or the next or on any condition other than the operation of intellectual intuition, which Mou considered available to all people at all times.

In arguing for the historical absence of such a solution to the problem of the perfect good anywhere outside of China, Mou did acknowledge that Epicurean and Stoic philosophers also tried to establish that virtue resulted in happiness, but he claimed that their explanations only worked by redefining either virtue or happiness in order to reduce its meaning to something analytically entailed by the other. However, some critics have argued that Mou’s alternative commits the same fault by effectively collapsing happiness into virtue.

4. Criticisms

Mou has often been accused of irrationalism due to his doctrine of the direct, supra-sensory intellectual intuition, which states that people can apprehend the deeper reality underlying the mere phenomena that are measured and described by scientific knowledge. Mou has also been ridiculed because he did not so much present positive arguments in favor of his main metaphysical beliefs as propound them as definitive facts, presumably known to him through a privileged access to sagely intuition.

Critics also frequently question the relevance of Mou’s philosophy, both to the Confucian tradition from which he took his inspiration, as well as to Chinese society. They point out that Mou’s thought (as well as that of other inheritors of Xiong Shili’s legacy in general) inhabits a far different social context than the Confucian tradition with which he identifies. With Mou and his generation, Chinese philosophy was detached from its old homes in the traditional schools of classical learning (shuyuan), the Imperial civil service, and monasteries and hermitages, and was transplanted into the new setting of the modern university, with its disciplinary divisions and limited social role. Critics point to this academicization as evidence that, despite Mou’s aspirations to kindle a massive revival of the Confucian spirit in China, his thought risks being little more than a “lost soul,” deracinated and intellectualized. The first problem with this, they claim, is that Mou reduces Confucianism to a philosophy in the modern academic sense and leaves out other important aspects of the pre-modern Confucian cultural system, such as its art, literature, and ritual and its political and career institutions. Second, they claim, because Mou’s brand of Confucianism accents metaphysics so heavily, it remains confined to departments of philosophy and powerless to exert any real influence over Chinese society.

Mou has also been criticized for his explicit essentialism. In keeping with his Hegelian tendency, he presented China as consisting essentially of Chinese culture, and even more particularly with Chinese philosophy, and he claimed in turn that this is epitomized by Confucian philosophy.  Furthermore, he presents the Confucian tradition as consisting essentially of an idiosyncratic-looking list of Confucian thinkers. Opponents complain that even if there were good reasons for Mou to enshrine his handful of favorite Confucians as the very embodiment of all of Chinese culture, this would remain Mou’s opinion and nothing more, a mere interpretation rather than the objective, factual historical insight that Mou claimed it was.

5. Influence

In Mou’s last decades, he began to be recognized together with other prominent students of Xiong Shili as a leader of what came to be called the “New Confucian” (dangdai xin rujia) movement, which aspires to revive and modernize Confucianism as a living spiritual tradition. Through his many influential protégés, Mou achieved great influence over the agenda of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Two of his early students, Liu Shu-hsien (b. 1934)  and Tu Wei-ming (b. 1940) have been especially active in raising the profile of contemporary Confucianism in English-speaking venues, as has the Canadian-born scholar John Berthrong (b. 1946). Mou’s emphasis on Kant’s transcendental analytic gave new momentum to research on Kant and post-Kantians, particularly in the work of Mou’s student Lee Ming-huei (b. 1953), and his writings on Buddhism lie behind much of the interest in and interpretation of Tiantai philosophy among Chinese scholars. Finally, Mou functions as the main modern influence on, and point of reference for, the intense research on Confucianism among mainland Chinese philosophers today.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Angle, Stephen C. Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Angle, Stephen C. Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy. Cambridge: Polity, 2012.
  • Asakura, Tomomi. “On Buddhistic Ontology: A Comparative Study of Mou Zongsan and Kyoto School Philosophy.” Philosophy East and West 61/4 (October 2011): 647-678.
  • Berthrong, John. “The Problem of Mind: Mou Tsung-san's Critique of Chu Hsi." Journal of Chinese Religion 10 (1982): 367-394.
  • Berthrong, John. All Under Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. “Mou Zongsan's Problem with the Heideggerian Interpretation of Kant.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/2 (June 2006): 225-247.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. Thinking through Confucian Modernity: A Study of Mou Zongsan's Moral Metaphysics. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Bunnin, Nicholas. “God's Knowledge and Ours: Kant and Mou Zongsan on Intellectual Intuition.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 35/4 (December 2008): 613-624.
  • Chan, N. Serina. “What is Confucian and New about the Thought of Mou Zongsan?” in New Confucianism: A Critical Examination, ed. John Makeham (New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003), 131-164.
  • Chan, N. Serina. The Thought of Mou Zongsan. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan on Zen Buddhism.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 5/1 (2005) : 73-88.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan's Transformation of Kant's Philosophy.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/1 (March 2006): 125-139.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi on Zhang Zai's and Wang Fuzhi's Philosophies of Qi : A Critical Reflection.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 10/1 (March 2011): 85-98.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “On Mou Zongsan's Hermeneutic Application of Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 174-189.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk and Henry C. H. Shiu. “Introduction: Mou Zongsan and Chinese Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 169-173.
  • Clower, Jason. The Unlikely Buddhologist: Tiantai Buddhism in the New Confucianism of Mou Zongsan. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2010.
  • Clower, Jason. “Mou Zongsan on the Five Periods of the Buddha's Teaching. Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 190-205.
  • Guo Qiyong. “Mou Zongsan’s View of Interpreting Confucianism by ‘Moral Autonomy’.” Frontiers of Philosophy in China 2/3 (June 2007): 345-362.
  • Kantor, Hans-Rudolf. “Ontological Indeterminacy and Its Soteriological Relevance: An Assessment of Mou Zongsan's (1909-1995) Interpretation of Zhiyi's (538-597) Tiantai Buddhism.” Philosophy East and West 56/1 (January 2006): 16-68.
  • Kwan, Chun-Keung. “Mou Zongsan’s Ontological Reading of Tiantai Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 206-222.
  • Lin, Chen-kuo. “Dwelling in Nearness to the Gods: The Hermeneutical Turn from MOU Zongsan to TU Weiming.” Dao 7 (2008): 381-392.
  • Lin, Tongqi and Zhou Qin. “The Dynamism and Tension in the Anthropocosmic Vision of Mou Zongsan.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 22/4 (December 1995): 401-440.
  • Liu, Shu-hsien. “Mou Tsung-san (Mou Zongsan)” in Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. A.S. Cua. New York: Routledge, 2003.
  • Mou, Tsung-san [Mou Zongsan]. “The Immediate Successor of Wang Yang-ming: Wang Lung-hsi and his Theory of Ssu-wu.” Philosophy East and West 23/1-2 (1973): 103-120.
  • Neville, Robert C. Boston Confucianism: Portable Tradition in the Late-Modern World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Stephan Schmidt. “Mou Zongsan, Hegel, and Kant: The Quest for Confucian Modernity.” Philosophy East and West 61/2 (April 2011): 260-302.
  • Shiu, Henry C.H. “Nonsubstantialism of the Awakening of Faith in Mou Zongsan.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 223-237.
  • Tang, Andres Siu-Kwong. “Mou Zongsan’s ‘Transcendental’ Interpretation of Huayan Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 238-256.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Centrality and Commonality: An Essay on Confucian Religiousness. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989.
  • Tu, Xiaofei. “Dare to Compare: The Comparative Philosophy of Mou Zongsan.” Kritike 1/2 (December 2007): 24-35.
  • Zheng Jiadong. “Mou Zongsan and the Contemporary Circumstances of the Rujia.” Contemporary Chinese Thought 36/2 (Winter 2004-5): 67-88.
  • Zheng Jiadong. “Between History and Thought: Mou Zongsan and the New Confucianism That Walked Out of History.” Contemporary Chinese Thought 36/2 (Winter 2004-5): 49-66.

Author Information

Jason Clower
California State University, Chico
U. S. A.

Feng Youlan (Fung Yu-lan, 1895—1990)

Feng Youlan (romanized as Fung Yu-lan) was a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Throughout his long and turbulent life, he consistently engaged the problem of reconciling traditional Chinese thought with the methods and concerns of modern Western philosophy. Raised by a modernist family who nonetheless gave him a traditional Confucian education, Feng pursued two great goals during his career: rewriting the history of Chinese philosophy from a modern perspective, and developing a reconstructed version of Chinese philosophy that could respond to the modern situation. The famous translator of Chinese philosophical texts, Wing-tsit Chan, summed up Feng’s contribution by saying: “At a time when Chinese intellectuals saw little value in the Chinese tradition, Professor Feng upheld it.”

Although Feng published his monumental and still-influential Zhongguo zhexue shi (History of Chinese Philosophy) in 1934, his effort to synthesize the traditional Neo-Confucianism of Cheng Hao, Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi with the philosophical traditions of the modern West that he studied with John Dewey took much longer to complete and arguably was never entirely successful. Between 1939 and 1947, during the early years of China’s occupation by Japan, Feng published Xin lixue (New Teaching of Principle), in which he presented Chinese philosophy, particularly Confucianism, as valuable for addressing both “the True Realm” (corresponding to the transcendent, metaphysical world of what Confucians call li – “principle” or cosmic norms – and ti, “substance”) and “the Real Realm” (corresponding to the immanent, physical world of qi, “energy” or material forms, and yong, “function”). Feng contrasted Daoist philosophy, which he labeled “the philosophy of subtraction” (that is, inward-looking and seeking unity with nature), and both Mohist and Western philosophy, which he described as “the philosophy of augmentation” (that is, outward-looking and seeking to master nature); with Confucian philosophy, which he saw as “the middle way” between so-called “other-worldly” and “this-worldly” philosophies.

Due to political upheaval in China following the defeat of Japan and the successful Communist revolution in the 1940s, Feng proved unable to continue this philosophical project and in many ways reversed direction. Telling Chinese Communist Party chairman Mao Zedong that he was “unwilling to be a remnant of a bygone age in a time of greatness,” Feng devoted himself to reinterpreting both his earlier work and Chinese philosophy in general through the lens of Marxist thought, which had become the orthodox ideology in mainland China under Mao’s rule, even going so far as to denounce Confucius during the final years of the Cultural Revolution (1966-1976). This effort provoked great controversy among his peers, many of whom had fled China to establish “New Confucian” enclaves within the universities of Hong Kong and Taiwan as well as in the West. Partly as a result of his controversial immersion in Maoist politics, Feng’s most enduring contribution to Chinese philosophy probably is his historical account of the subject rather than his own philosophical synthesis. Nonetheless, his work remains an interesting example of the way in which early 20th century Chinese thinkers attempted to develop a rational philosophical system that was credible to both Chinese and Western traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophical Works
    1. A Comparative Study of Life Ideals
    2. Six Books of Zhengyuan
  3. A History of Chinese Philosophy
  4. Influence
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Feng Youlan, whose zi (“style”) or courtesy name was Zhisheng, was born on December 4, 1895, in Tanghe County, Henan Province, to an affluent and prominent family.  Feng’s father completed the highest level of study required by the Qing dynasty imperial civil service and headed the local Confucian academy, but also maintained a personal library that included books about the West and modern affairs. From the age of six, Feng pursued a private education in the Confucian curriculum typical of the time, but had little interest in traditional rote learning. At the age of fifteen, he began studying in the county middle school and one year later transferred to high school, first in the provincial capital of Kaifeng, and then in neighboring Hubei Province. At the age of seventeen, he was admitted to the preparatory class of the Chinese Public University in Shanghai, where all courses were taught with English textbooks and the curriculum included Western logic and philosophy.

Feng studied philosophy at Peking (Beijing) University from 1915 to 1918, during which time he was exposed to various forms of foreign thought, ranging from the philosophy of Henri Bergson to the “New Realism” associated with British philosophers such as W. P. Montague. Also during this time, the New Cultural Movement, which questioned traditional Confucian values, was in full swing, provoking counter-reactions from conservative Confucian scholars. At Peking University, Feng met both Hu Shi (1891-1962), the iconoclast critic of Confucianism and Liang Shuming (1893-1988), the New Confucian apologist and social activist. In 1919, he traveled to the United States and, like Hu Shi before him, studied with John Dewey at Columbia University. He was deeply impressed by the United States’ advanced technology, emphasis on commerce, and atmosphere of law and order, which helped to confirm his sense that the Chinese psyche was inward-looking, contemplative, and holistic, while the Western spirit was outward-looking, analytical, and reductionistic. He was among the first to introduce Liang Shuming’s work to America.

In 1923, Feng completed his Ph.D. at Columbia, having entitled his dissertation A Comparison of Life Ideals. Looking back at this early work some sixty years later, Feng wrote:

I maintained that the difference between cultures is the difference between the East and the West. This was in fact the prevailing opinion at that time.  However, as I further studied the history of philosophy, I found this prevailing opinion to be incorrect. I discovered that what is considered to be the philosophy of the East has existed in the history of the philosophy of the West as well, and vice versa. I discovered that mankind has the same essential nature and the same problems of life... (Feng 2008: 658)

After completing his doctoral studies at Columbia, Feng returned to China and began his long teaching career there, having paid close attention to intellectual trends in China while he was abroad. Between 1923 and 1926, Feng held appointments in the philosophy departments of several Chinese universities, culminating in his being named Chair of the Philosophy Department and Dean of College of Humanities at Beijing’s prestigious Tsinghua (Qinghua) University in 1927.

In 1934, Feng had a fateful encounter with Communist ideology that would influence the future course of his life. While en route to a philosophical conference in Prague, he stopped to visit the Soviet Union, where he found a grand social experiment in progress.  Although he was not blind to the imperfections of Soviet Communism, he also was attracted to its utopian possibilities, as he later proclaimed in public speeches. As a result of his visit to the Soviet Union, he was detained briefly by Jiang Jieshi’s (Chiang Kai-shek’s) Nationalist government, but upon his release established a close relationship with the regime, which then ruled China despite the revolutionary activities of Communist factions. The outbreak of war between China and Japan in 1937 inspired Feng to work for the patriotic recognition and preservation of China’s unique philosophical heritage.  Between 1937 and 1946, he published a series of books to help justify Jiang Jieshi’s New Life Movement, which sought to safeguard the prosperity of the nation by instilling traditional values into Chinese citizens’ daily lives and transforming their moral character.

Due to political upheaval in China following the defeat of Japan in 1945 and the successful Communist revolution in 1949, Feng proved unable to continue this philosophical project and in many ways reversed direction. Telling Chinese Communist Party chairman Mao Zedong that he was “unwilling to be a remnant of a bygone age in a time of greatness,” Feng renounced his association with the Nationalist regime and devoted himself to reinterpreting both his earlier work and Chinese philosophy in general through the lens of Marxist thought, which had become the orthodox ideology in mainland China under Mao’s rule. This new work provoked great controversy among his peers, many of whom had fled China to establish “New Confucian” enclaves within the universities of Hong Kong and Taiwan as well as in the West.

Despite his apparent conversion to doctrinaire Marxism, Feng attempted to preserve a place for Confucianism under Mao’s aegis, asserting that this and other Chinese philosophical traditions, despite their reactionary historical baggage, could be “conceptually and abstractly” relevant in the Communist era. For example, Feng argued that the Confucian concept of ren or “benevolence” had in the past served the purpose of making the oppressed and exploited masses lose sight of intense class struggle and had sedated them into believing a dream of an impossible classless and harmonious society. Feng believed, however, that if taken “abstractly,” ren for all people could be a helpful idea even in Mao’s “New China.”

During China’s Cultural Revolution (1966-1976) Feng, along with many other academics, was denounced by Mao. Near the end of this period, however, Feng was able to regain a measure of public influence by allying himself with Mao’s wife, Jiang Qing, who enlisted his aid in her propaganda campaign against Confucius between 1973 and 1976. After Mao’s death and Jiang’s arrest and imprisonment, Feng’s political decisions cost him both his mianzi (“face” or public reputation) and, for a short time, his freedom.  By the 1980s, Feng was able to return to teaching and began work on a new manuscript entitled A New History of Chinese Philosophy, which was incomplete when he died in 1990.

2. Philosophical Works

a. A Comparative Study of Life Ideals

In 1923, Feng wrote his doctoral thesis A Comparative Study of Life Ideals. As the title of his thesis suggests, the relationship between Chinese and Western cultures was the focal point of his philosophical thinking. According to Feng, all forms of philosophy fall into three categories: “the philosophy of subtraction,” “the philosophy of augmentation,” and “the middle way.” Philosophers who value the natural world and distain human interference with nature wish to return to a state of innocence by reducing human artifice and interference. In this camp Feng placed Laozi and Zhuangzi, both of whom advocated “abandoning humanity and righteousness” and “eliminating sagehood and wisdom.” On the other hand, Feng saw both Western thought and Mozi’s philosophy as encouraging the conquest and transformation of nature and thus belonging to “the philosophy of augmentation.” Finally, Confucianism as Feng sees it insists on cultivating a balanced relationship between humans and nature and is therefore the middle way.

b. Six Books of Zhengyuan

The so-called Six Books of Zhengyuan include A New Philosophy of Principle, New Discourses on Events, New Social Admonitions, A New Inquiry into Man, A New Inquiry into the Tao, and A New Understanding of Language. Here, Feng’s approach was strongly constructive, as he intended to carry forward the Chinese philosophical tradition through these publications. Inspired by Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi, Feng called his philosophy the “New Philosophy of Principle” (Xin lixue).

In order to understand Feng’s reinterpretation of Neo-Confucian thought, it is necessary to examine the Neo-Confucian concepts of li (“principle” or “cosmic pattern”) and qi (“energy” or “material force”). Feng understood these paired concepts as representing the ontological relationship between the universal and the particular. The universal is eternal, abstract and intangible, yet it has a certain material basis in the concrete world or the world of “instruments,” as the Yijing (Book of Changes) describes it: “That which is above physical form is the Dao (“Way”); those things contained by physical form are instruments.” Objects in the concrete world that have physical form are not the proper objects of philosophical thinking. Rather, philosophy is concerned with knowing the universal through logical analysis. Feng distinguished between the metaphysical world of li (which he called “the True Realm”) and and ti (“substance”) and the physical world of qi (“the Real Realm”) and yong (“function”). The True Realm is like an arcane book, such that those with untrained eyes see only blank pages, but philosophical minds see meaningful words engraved on them. Between the two, the True Realm is “first,” not temporally but ontologically. That is, a given class of things in the Real Realm is an imperfect revelation of certain principle in the True Realm. Feng’s reimagined Confucian ethics, in shaping human society, is functionally derived from Principle of the True Realm.

Feng’s “New Philosophy of Principle” is realist in outlook – that is, it assumes that moral truths exist as facts, and thus that ethics and ontology are interrelated. As facts, moral truths really exist, and possess an inherent but abstract existence as “principle” (li). This “principle” manifests itself concretely as “material force” (qi) in the ever-flowing phenomenal world of the Way (Dao). Like Neo-Confucian thinkers long before him, Feng adapted Chinese Buddhism’s notion of “the emptiness of emptiness” to develop his notion of the Great Whole (daquan), or the totality of all that exists. Within the Great Whole, all things are one, and human beings find their purpose. The self-definition of human beings inevitably comes from their understanding of the universe.

All of this is very much in keeping with traditional Chinese thought’s concern for the harmonious relationship between Heaven, nature and human beings. Feng’s comparative studies of Plato and Zhu Xi, on the one hand, and of Immanuel Kant and the Daoists, on the other hand, represent a revamped lixue based on the fundamental outline of Zhu Xi’s highly influential philosophical synthesis, which (unlike the efforts of most of Feng’s fellow “New Confucians”), bid fair to become a major contribution to world philosophy.  Unfortunately, Feng proved unable to revise, refine, or elaborate upon this groundbreaking work of the 1930s.

3. A History of Chinese Philosophy

Feng began work on A History of Chinese Philosophy during the 1920s. Prior to its publication in 1934, the only available modern critical history of Chinese philosophy was Hu Shi’s Outlines of the History of Chinese Philosophy (1919), which was the first attempt to break away from traditional genres of writing about the history of Chinese philosophy. The latter are often based on unexamined genealogical traditions and historically unreliable materials. In addition, the traditional writings are typically in the form of commentaries and even random notes and reflections on classical texts, and lack a systematic approach. Hu attempted to address these two issues by offering critical scholarship analyzing and authenticating historical documents, on the one hand, and providing a survey of Chinese thought by means of employing Western philosophical concepts, on the other hand. The problem with Hu’s work was that he never finished it. Feng decided to follow in Hu’s footsteps and compose a comprehensive and critical historical account of Chinese philosophy, using the scholarly tools he had mastered at Columbia University. In contrast with Hu’s effort to dismantle and debunk Chinese traditions, however, Feng claimed that his approach more accurately and honestly interpreted the various schools and thinkers of Chinese philosophical traditions. Having based his own philosophy on Confucian concepts, Feng insisted on the central role of Confucianism in Chinese intellectual history.

Feng self-consciously adopted a modern approach to Chinese philosophy. He abandoned the traditional view that all historical Chinese thought was an imperfect interpretation of perfect truths revealed by ancient sages. However, unlike Hu Shi and other iconoclastic scholars of the time, Feng refused to see history as pious fabrications concocted by the political and religious powers of old. His method was to interpret and appreciate tradition as a valuable historical legacy. For instance, against traditional commentators, Feng insisted that the Laozi (also known as the Daodejing) was written at a time much later than the Spring and Autumn Period (770-481 B.C.E.)—a view since borne out by archaeological discoveries, although the date of the text remains a contested issue among scholars. But this does not make the Laozi a worthless forgery, as the iconoclasts contended. Feng was also extremely keen on creating a comprehensive understanding of the entire history of Chinese philosophy. Feng’s intention was to give his readers a sense of the direction and development in Chinese philosophy. He wanted to show that there were periods when Chinese thought was original and creative (such as in the era prior to the Qin dynasty’s establishment in 221 B.C.E.), followed by other periods when it became rigid and stagnant (as in the late feudal society of the 18th and 19th centuries). He also stressed that true philosophy came from observing nature and social life, not from lofty theories and hair-splitting textual analysis.

Many scholars see Feng’s historiographical contributions to Chinese philosophy as much more significant than his original constructive contributions as a Chinese philosopher.  Prior to the publication of A History of Chinese Philosophy, Chinese thinkers did not group their traditional schools of thought with “philosophy” as understood in the West.  It was not until the very late 19th century, in fact, that a word for “philosophy” appeared in East Asian languages. The Japanese thinker Nishi Amane (1829-1897) coined the term tetsugaku, “the study of wisdom,” to approximate the Western concept of “philosophy,” and this term was adopted for use in Chinese by the scholar-official Huang Zunxian (1848-1905) as zhexue, which typically was reserved for the description of Western thought, excluding traditional Chinese thought. Although this exclusive and Eurocentric view of philosophy still has its adherents, Feng’s achievement was in defining Chinese thought and Western thought in terms of the common category of zhexue or “philosophy.”

A History of Chinese Philosophy appeared in several different translations, first in Derk Bodde’s English edition and later in several other languages, including Japanese, French, Italian, Korean, and German. During Feng’s 1948 visit to the University of Pennsylvania, he gave lectures that later became the basis of the English-language book, A Short History of Chinese Philosophy (1948). In the 1980s, Feng began – but never completed – a revised, Marxist version of A History of Chinese Philosophy, which was to be called A New History of Chinese Philosophy.

4. Influence

Views of Feng’s philosophical legacy vary according to cultural context. In China, Feng is considered to be one of the few original philosophers that twentieth-century China produced. Not remembered for his classroom eloquence by his former students, Feng Youlan nevertheless was able to impart his scholarship on, and passion for, Chinese philosophy to generations of students, many of whom currently hold teaching positions in elite Chinese universities.

As a result of their renewed interest in twentieth-century “New Confucian” thinkers, contemporary Chinese scholars have devoted a considerable amount of scholarship to Feng’s “New Philosophy of Principle” (xin lixue), which they typically regard as a systematic and sophisticated endeavor. For many of his Chinese admirers, Feng’s works are evidence that ancient Chinese (especially Confucian) conceptions can be retooled and made useful for modern times. The influence of Feng’s thought is likely to become greater as Confucian traditions enjoy something of a revival across contemporary China.

In the West, on the other hand, Feng’s influence is limited mainly to the reception of A History of Chinese Philosophy, which has been translated into multiple Western languages. With the exception of a few somewhat obscure publications, there has not been substantial Western scholarly engagement of general philosophical interest with Feng’s works. Often recommended as an indispensable read for students of Chinese culture, history, and thought, A History of Chinese Philosophy also has received criticism for its apparent partiality to Confucianism over Buddhism and Daoism, China’s two other great spiritual and intellectual traditions. Although Feng considered himself to be a philosopher, his reputation outside of China is that of an historian, and the nature of Western academic interest in Feng has focused on him as an historical figure in his own right, who lived during a particularly critical and troubled moment in the development of modern China.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Chen, Derong. Metaphorical Metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy: Illustrated with Feng Youlan’s New Metaphysics. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2011.
  • Chen, Lai. Tradition and Modernity: A Humanist View. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2009.
  • Cheng, Chung-Ying, and Nicholas Bunnin, eds. Contemporary Chinese Philosophy. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 2002.
  • de Bary, William Theodore, and others, eds. Sources of Chinese Tradition. 2 vols. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999-2000.
  • Feng, Youlan. Selected Philosophical Writings of Feng Yu-lan. Beijing: Foreign Languages Press, 2008.
  • Feng, Youlan. The Hall of Three Pines: An Account of My Life. Trans. Denis C. Mair. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 1999.
  • Feng, Youlan. The Spirit of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Ernest Richard Hughes. Boston: Beacon Press, 1962.
  • Feng, Youlan. A History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1952-53.
  • Feng, Youlan. A Short History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. New York: Free Press, 1948.
  • Makeham, John. New Confucianism: A Critical Examination. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003.
  • Masson, Michel C. Philosophy and Tradition: The Interpretation of China’s Philosophic Past -- Fung Youlan, 1939-1949. Taipei: Ricci Institute, 1985.
  • Obenchain, Diane B., ed. Something Exists: Selected papers of the International Research Seminar on the Thought of Feng Youlan. Honolulu: Dialogue Publishing, 1994.
  • Teoh, Vivienne. The Post ’49 Critiques of Confucius in the PRC, with Special Emphasis on the Views of Feng Youlan and Yang Rongguo: A Case Study of the Relationship between Contemporary Political Values and the Re-evaluation of the History of Chinese Philosophy. Thesis (Ph.D.) -- University of New South Wales, 1982.
  • Wycoff, William Alfred. The New Rationalism of Fung Yu-Lan. Thesis (Ph. D.) --Columbia University, 1975.


Author Information

Xiaofei Tu
Appalachian State University
U. S. A.

Wang Chong (Wang Ch’ung) (25—100 C.E.)

Wang Chong (Wang Ch’ung) was an early Chinese philosopher who wrote during the Eastern Han dynasty. He is often interpreted as offering a materialist and skeptical philosophical system.  Wang’s essays on physics, astronomy, ethics, methodology, and criticism are collected in the Lunheng (“Balanced Discussions”), the work for which he is mainly known.  Largely self-taught, Wang demonstrates an encyclopedic knowledge of history and science in his work, and it was primarily as an encyclopedic resource that Wang’s Lunheng was read and preserved in later Chinese history.  The essays of the Lunheng focus on criticism of common views on all areas of philosophy and physics, and on appraisal of traditional philosophical texts.  Although much of Wang’s work is critical, he also develops positive views on a number of important topics, including methodology, the spontaneous workings of heaven and earth, and the concepts of qi (vital essence), ming (destiny), and xing (behavioral characteristics).  Although Wang’s influence was minimal during and immediately after his lifetime and for many years afterward (until a brief period of interest in the late 11th and 12th centuries), there was a resurgence of interest in his work in the 19th and 20th centuries both in China and the West, following the ascendance of scientific materialism in modern thought.  Interest in Wang was generated in this period by (in the West) studies in early Chinese science by figures such as Joseph Needham and Alfred Forke, and (in China) first by the critical movements in the late Qing and later the rise to dominance of the materialist Marxist thought of the Communist Party, which praised and elevated Wang’s thought for its opposition to superstition, materialism, and skepticism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Textual Issues and Literary Style
  3. Purpose and Method
    1. On “Creation and Transmission”
    2. Truth/Reality (shi)
  4. Critical Thought
    1. Specific Criticisms of Philosophers
      1. Confucius
      2. Han Feizi
    2. Ghosts, the Supernatural, and Other Superstitions
      1. Ghosts
      2. Talent and Success
  5. Physics and Metaphysics
    1. Qi (Vital Essence/Fluid)
    2. Tian (Heaven)
    3. Astronomy and Physics
      1. Celestial Objects
      2. Heaven and Earth
  6. Ethics
    1. Ming (Destiny)
    2. Xing (Characteristics)
  7. Influence
    1. Influences and Place in Han Dynasty Thought
    2. Later Influence
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Wang Chong was born in the year 27 C.E. (according to his autobiography), in the village of Shangyu in Kuaiji Commandery (modern day Shaoxing, Zhejiang province) along the eastern coast of China.  His birth came in the third year of the reign of the first Eastern Han emperor Guangwu, who restored the Han Dynasty after defeating Wang Mang, the man who had seized power from the Western (or Early) Han and established the short lived “Xin” (New) Dynasty (9-23 C.E.). According to Wang in his autobiographical essay (contained in Lunheng), his family, reaching back to his grandfather Wang Fan (whose son Wang Song was Wang Chong's father), was comprised of lower class troublemakers, even though it had more respectable origins, with Wang Fan's father having been a landowner.  Because of their status and behavior, Wang Chong's family moved a number of times, finally settling in Kuaiji.

In his autobiographical chapter, Wang speaks of his youth being one of straitened circumstances.  He was, however, still able to get an education by reading books while sitting around the stalls of booksellers, and in this way gained an encyclopedic knowledge of history, philosophy, and religion, as evidenced in Lunheng.  Based on the breadth of his knowledge, Wang Chong was (if his claims are taken seriously) one of the greatest autodidacts of early Chinese history.  His self-taught style is evidenced by the uncommon (some might claim awkward) literary style of his writings, which Wang defends in the autobiographical essay contained in Lunheng.

Wang rose to the position of Officer of Merit (gong shi) in Kuaiji, but held this position only briefly, his contrarian spirit no doubt making important enemies for him which led to the demise of his career.  This experience further disenchanted Wang with “common morals and beliefs,” and he went into retirement to write a number of works challenging these common views.  According to Wang, he was inspired to write “On Government” (Zhengwu) to remedy the perceived inadequacy of the imperial government (likely that of Emperor Ming but possibly that of Emperor Zhang), reinvigorating those engaged in governing.  His “Censures on Common Morals” (Jisu jieyi) was written in response to a number of “friends” who supported him while he had position quickly abandoning him once he lost his post.  Wang briefly held another position after this period, as an officer to Dong Qin, the inspector of Yang province, which he eventually resigned.

Also written during this period was “Macrobiotics” (Yangxing shu).  The work for which Wang Chong is known today (and his only extant work), Lunheng (“Balanced Discourses”) is likely a compilation of Wang's works from this period, composed between 70 and 80 B.C.E., including parts of the above-mentioned works.  Timoteus Pokora and Michael Loewe suggest that Lunheng may initially have been a distinct work containing specifically critical philosophical essays (numbers 16-30 of the present Lunheng) that was later expanded to include Wang's other extant writings to form a compilation under the same name.  They also suggest the biographical essay of Lunheng (Zi ji) may have been written by someone other than Wang (as its style and reference to Wang suggest).  The received version of Lunheng is based on Yang Wenchang’s 1045 C.E. edition.

In the later part of his life, again reclusive, Wang was requested at the court of the Emperor Zhang (Liu Da, 5th son of the Emperor Ming), on the recommendation of Wang's friend Xie Yiwu, but declined the invitation on grounds of illness.  This (which must have happened before Zhang's death in 88 C.E.) is the last account of the events of Wang Chong's life before his death around 100 C.E.  A memorial was erected to Wang Chong (claiming to mark his tomb) in 1855 and again in 1981 after the original memorial's destruction, that stands today in Shangyu.

2. Textual Issues and Literary Style

To a reader of Lunheng, it can appear that Wang sometimes contradicts himself, claiming one thing about a certain concept (such as qi, tian, or xing) in one essay that he rejects in another essay.  It should not be assumed on this basis, however, that Wang is inconsistent in his usage of key terms or confused about the concepts he discusses.  Lunheng should be seen as a kind of “collected works” of Wang Chong.  The various essays of the Lunheng are not ordered according to date of construction (it seems to be instead organized by theme), nor is any date noted anywhere in the text.  As a result, there is no way of knowing which essays were written at which points in Wang’s life, which essays were revised from earlier versions, based on alternative copies, and so forth.  Intellectual development and change, however, can be assumed throughout Wang’s career, and that some of the essays of Lunheng are more representative of Wang’s mature thought, and some of them his early thought.  This assumption cannot, of course, undermine or explain away all apparent inconsistency in Wang’s discussions (there is the possibility that he did in fact contradict himself or offer unclear or in some sense confused ideas), nor can it be certain which of the essays in the Lunheng represent which stage of Wang’s intellectual development. But it can be safely assumed that at least some of the inconsistency is due to the nature of the composition of Lunheng.
According to Wang himself, his style is deliberately simple and avoids “flowery language” which often perpetuates “empty” sayings (xu yan).  He argues at length in his essay Dui zuo that simple language and style (like his own) is essential for the project of searching for truth (shi), and that he purposefully says things in a simple and straightforward manner.

3. Purpose and Method

a. On “Creation and Transmission”

Wang is concerned to defend himself against charges of innovation, which was a major controversy in the Han dynasty, arising from the claims of Confucius (almost universally regarded as a sage or the highest sage) that he does not create (zuo), but merely transmits (shu) the ideas of the ancient sages.  This was taken as normative, such that it was read as an injunction for people not to create and instead merely to transmit.  To create was seen as arrogant and taken as tantamount to likening oneself to the sages or claiming superiority over them, which was seen as an unforgivable intellectual error.  A common criticism of literary works in Wang's own time was to dismiss them on the grounds that they were “creations” (zuo), and thus arrogant and false attempts at innovation and self-aggrandizement by their authors.  Doubtlessly this charge was brought against Wang's own work, because he feels the need to counter these charges in various essays in Lunheng, most directly and extensively in the essay Dui zuo (“Responses Concerning Creation”)

There, he argues that his work is not a creation, but is rather a “discussion” (lun), in which he considers the claims and arguments of other literary works and subjects them to questions and challenges in order to discover what in them is true, useful, or otherwise acceptable.  A creation, he argues, is something wholly new, and as such there are very few creations.  Almost no literary text counts as a creation, except for the very first invention of written language, as no literary work can wholly be independent and free from influence of the linguistic forms and thought of previous generations.  He further argues that even if his work could be considered a “creation”, it would still not be problematic.  Literary works ought to be appraised not on their faithfulness or lack thereof to the tradition or the views of the ancients, but instead on their truthfulness, usefulness, and correspondence to reality.  If a literary work is full of empty words and falsehoods, it should be rejected, even if conforming to tradition.  Likewise, if a literary work offers truths, it should be accepted, whether it is an innovation or not.  The ancients were not perfect—they were human, were ignorant of a great many things, and had the same tendencies to make mistakes and accept falsehoods that contemporaries do.  If things are merely accepted on the basis of their arising from tradition and the beliefs of the ancients (and conversely reject things not conforming with this standard), posterity is bound to simply perpetuate the mistakes inevitably made by the ancients, and accept the same falsehoods they did.

Wang is not, however, simply a contrarian or iconoclast.  He does think that there are a great many truths that can be learned from the ancients, and that  their teachings should not be rejected completely.  They should, however, be appraised using the methods he suggests of questioning and challenging (wen nan), in order to discover what is acceptable in these teachings.

Much of Wang's critical material is devoted to various questions to and challenges of the writings and teachings of received and traditional works, as well as common (su) views and folk beliefs.  It is this aspect of Wang's thought that has received most attention since the resurgence of interest in his work in the late 19th century in China and the west.  Because of this emphasis, Wang has often been labeled a “skeptic” (more common in early work on him than today).  This label, however, is somewhat misleading, given that Wang, as shown in below sections, had quite robust positive positions in metaphysics, ethics, and physical thought.  Wang saw his critical project as in the service of his positive project of obtaining the truth in general.

b. Truth/Reality (shi)

According to Wang his work aims at what he sees as the proper pursuit of literary and philosophical work in general, attainment of or discovery of truth, or reality (shi), and avoidance of falsity/empty words (xu, xu yan).  His method for discovery of truth largely consists in appraising the existing teachings and arguments of other philosophers, scholars, and schools, subjecting them to tests he describes as “questioning” (nan) and “challenging” (wen), standards that Wang in some places seems to take as interchangeable and other places he takes as distinct tools that operate differently.
One of the central features of true (shi) words, according to Wang, is that they are not flowery or ornate (hua), but direct and to the point.  Among other things, the term shi connotes the quality of concreteness.  Flowery or ornate words, on the other hand, are always to some extent empty.  Truth is only captured in simple and efficient language.  Thus, anything overly stylized is in some way an exaggeration, whether a major exaggeration (like words expressing the existence of supernatural beings such as ghosts) or a relatively minor one (attributing sagehood to a person who has merely done some good act).  The express purpose of Wang’s writing is based in appraisal.  Wang says, in the Dui zuo chapter:

“The Lunheng uses precise language and detailed discussion, to reveal and explain the doubts of this generation of common people, to bring to light through debate right and wrong patterns (shi fei zhi li), and to help those who come later clearly see the difference between what is the case and what is not the case.” (Lunheng, Dui zuo pian 84.364.10-11)

4. Critical Thought

a. Specific Criticisms of Philosophers

Although Wang subjects the writings of various philosophers to his questions and challenges in various parts of the Lunheng, his criticisms of two particular philosophers, Confucius and Han Feizi, are representative of his general critical view and method concerning received texts and teachings.

i. Confucius

Wang challenges Confucius on a number of points in the essay Wen kong (“Questioning Confucius”), most of these surrounding various inconsistencies and eccentricities in the Analects.  Although he accepts Confucius as a sage, Wang argues that Confucius did not always know what he was talking about, could be rash, cryptic, irritable, and uncharitable.  All of these features affected Confucius' teachings, and thus what he says cannot be automatically trusted since they are the words of a sage.  For Wang, there is much in the Analects – for example, passages that reflect the influence of Mengzi or Mencius, which Wang saw as having corrupted the transmission of Confucius’ thought – and ought to be rejected.

ii. Han Feizi

Wang is far less positive about Han Feizi.  In the beginning of his essay Fei han (“Against Han Fei”), he says that he completely rejects Han Feizi's views, on the basis of what he sees as a basic contradiction between his political theory and his action.  Han Feizi argues that scholars (specifically ru or Confucian scholars) are useless, that they drain the resources of the state while contributing nothing to the maintenance of state power.  For this reason, Han Feizi concludes they ought not to be employed by the state.  Wang points out in this essay that Han Feizi himself is a scholar, and certainly takes his own advice and views to be of benefit to the state.  If so, his claim of the uselessness of scholars is incorrect.  Alternatively, if he is right about the uselessness of scholars, it follows that his own teachings must be useless, and therefore false.  In the rest of the essay, Wang constructs an argument against Han Feizi in defense of the place of virtue and imitation of the sages, which the ru scholars are employed to teach.

b. Ghosts, the Supernatural, and Other Superstitions

In addition to his challenges to specific philosophers and texts, Wang criticizes a number of things he calls “common” or “vulgar” (su) beliefs, traditions, and superstitions, often concerning things such as the existence and agency of supernatural entities such as ghosts, deities, mythical creatures such as dragons, and Heaven itself as a sentient agent.  Among the views he is concerned to dispatch is the view that these supernatural entities have the power to reward and punish people for their actions, which is entrenched in Han society.
Wang attacks a great number of “common” beliefs throughout the Lunheng, including (but not limited to): the view that Heaven rewards and punishes people for their behavior, the view that natural and weather events such as thunder and lightning or earthquakes represent the anger (or other emotion) of Heaven or some other supernatural agent; the view the that the mental states of the ruler (happiness, anger, beneficence and so forth) have some physical effect on the land or weather (such that it is warm outside when the ruler is happy and cold when he's angry); the view that people in the days of the ancients (not only the sages) were of greater moral ability and had more robust physical statures than contemporary people; and the view that a person's virtue and talent is linked to (has a causal role in) his professional success and personal fortune.  Wang's positions against ghosts and against the causal link between talent and success serve as good examples of this aspect of his critical thought.

i. Ghosts

Wang offers a number of arguments against what he sees as the “common” and superstitious belief in ghosts and other paranormal entities.  Perhaps his most sustained (and humorous) consideration of the difficulties with common beliefs about the existence and activities of ghosts comes in his essay Lun si (“Discussion Concerning Death”), in which he presents a number of fatal objections to the ghost hypothesis.
The following are three examples of arguments Wang gives against the common belief in ghosts and their ability to interact with living persons in Lun si:

(1) Argument from physical shape:  The death of a person is the result of the body losing the animating qi (vital essence), and once the qi is separated from the body, the body decays.  All will admit to this.  If this is so, however, and the person's qi is still existent, how can this qi itself manifest in the form of a physical shape?  It is not a body, it is qi.  But when one sees a ghost, one sees a body.  But if the person has died, they no longer have a body, so where could they get another one?  They cannot take over another living body, which will already possess its own qi.  Thus, the view that people when they die become ghosts is nonsensical.

(2) Argument from population:  If people become ghosts when they die, there should be more ghost sightings than living people, as the number of people who have lived in the past and died is far greater than the number of people now living.  This is not true — ghost “sightings” are rare.  Thus it cannot be that people when they die become ghosts.

(3) Argument from ghostly efficacy:  If a living person is harmed, this person will immediately go to a magistrate and bring a case against the party who harmed them.  If it were the case that people become ghosts when they die and can interact with living humans, every ghostly murder victim would be seen going to a magistrate, telling him the name of the killer and the means of murder, leading him to the body, and so forth.  This is never witnessed (ever).

ii. Talent and Success

Wang is concerned with arguing against the generally accepted view that success is proportionate to talent or virtue and that long life is proportionate to goodness.  Instead, Wang argues, a person’s success and fortune is tied to his destiny (ming), and the length of one’s life is tied to the amount and quality of qi one receives (spontaneously) at birth.  The common view, Wang claims, concerning success is that talent and virtue are determining factors for success, and that one can thus know whether a person is talented and/or virtuous by observing the person’s fortunes.  The high-ranking and powerful are clearly talented and virtuous, while the poor and rejected must lack talent and virtue.
Wang takes aim at this view in a number of essays in Lunheng (one gets the feeling that the special vitriol directed at this particular view is not unrelated to Wang’s own failure to achieve high office and the attendant perceptions or claims about his level of talent).  There are plenty of examples from history, Wang argues, that demonstrate a disconnect between talent and success.  The example of the sage himself, Confucius, suggests a problem with the common view.  No one was more talented than Confucius, Wang argues, yet his career was the very definition of failure.  It often happens that the vicious, duplicitous, and scheming person can rise to great heights in political (or other) power, while a person of genius or moral excellence fails to obtain position at all.  Luck is a greater factor in one’s success than talent.  The possible reasons for the rise of a vicious or untalented person are many.  Sometimes rulers are incompetent, lack time to reflect on their appointments, and are attracted to some irrelevant quality in a person, and so on.

5. Physics and Metaphysics

a. Qi (Vital Essence/Fluid)

Wang’s views of nature and events in the world are grounded in an explanatory system in which all changes are due to the spontaneous movement of qi (vital essence/fluid).  This qi is given forth by tian (heaven), and gives things their unique character.  Wang discusses many different types of qi, and the term is used to discuss such a wide-ranging number of phenomena that it becomes problematic to try to define just what the concept of qi is such that it is narrow enough to capture all of the phenomena Wang discusses.
He attributes all motion, causation, and even human character to qi, with different types of qi responsible for different kinds of event or character.  Tian creates qi, but not in an active and willful manner.  Rather, it is better to think of qi as emanating from tian.  In a number of places, Wang talks of the creation of things by tian as analogous to the creation of new persons through the mixing of sperm and egg (the male and female physical qi), in order to emphasize its spontaneity, or generation without intent or will.
Qi is at the center of Wang’s understanding of creative activity in the world.  He refers to qi to explain every non-agent based phenomenon he considers--such diverse events as the generation of a human, seasonal and temperature changes, physical health and length of life (although he ties this to ming in a way discussed below), and the creation and destruction or transformation of objects in general.  Qi, for Wang, seems to have a general as well as specific meanings, in general referring to a causally efficacious agent of change in entities in the world, and in specific referring to a particular causal qi, such as the (presumably physical) qi of the male and female that results in procreation when mixed together (Alfred Forke intuitively translates this as ‘fluid’), or the psychic qi causing behavioral dispositions (xing).
Qi emanates from or is created by tian (Heaven), although this creation should not be seen as agent creation.  Tian, as described below, creates spontaneously (ziran), and without intention.  Such creation is the paradigm of natural action, creation, destruction, and change, according to Wang.  Even humans, in some sense (described below) are determined in their physical and mental states and behaviors by causal features which happen spontaneously.  Wang is not altogether comfortable with the picture of the cosmos that seems to subsume human action fully in mechanistic nature, and in his account of human character and behavior he attempts to make room for human will or intention in his mechanistic scheme.  In his Ziran essay, he claims that what distinguishes humans from mere mechanistic puppets (ou ren) is the human possession of spontaneous nature/characteristics (xing ziran).  This seems to show Wang thinks of human agency as, in itself, spontaneous.  At the same time, the spontaneous nature of human agency cannot be the same spontaneity evident in the activity of heaven (tian), which should not, according to Wang, be thought of in terms of agency.

b. Tian (Heaven)

Wang argues against a number of “common” views concerning natural events that take such events to be directed by tian, as a divine agent, in response to human actions.  Wang rejects the agency of tian, instead seeing it naturalistically, as a principle generating qi spontaneously and without intention.  Causal efficacy is involved here without will or intention.  Tian has neither eyes nor mouth, hands nor feet (and presumably without a mind).
As is common of concepts in the Lunheng, there is more concentration on what tian is not than what exactly it is.  It is not exactly clear whether Wang thinks of tian as a constructive principle, the cosmos itself, the physical and distant source of qi, or something else completely.  All that he is explicit about is that tian is naturalistic, works spontaneously, and is unlike humans.
Since tian is not a divine agent, and cannot act intentionally, it cannot be the case, contrary the “common” view, that tian can reward people for virtuous action and punish them for vice.  The view of tian as rewarding and punishing agent is the one Wang is most concerned with overturning, and thus most of his explicit discussion of tian in Lunheng is focused on developing arguments against this view.  His specific arguments tend to fall into two categories:  argument from lack of efficacy and argument from lack of tools.
Regarding lack of efficacy, if tian can reward and punish as the common view claims, why can’t tian simply install proper or excellent rulers who will ensure things are done correctly, rather than allowing bad rulers to come to power who then have to be subsequently punished?  In addition, the claim that tian punishes people through seemingly natural events such as striking them by lightning and leaving etchings resembling words describing crimes they are guilty of on their forehead must be false.  Why would tian not be more efficient in its punishment?  And why would it not etch the character on the punished person’s head such that it was clearly legible, and thus could serve as a clear example for others?
Regarding lack of tools, tian has neither mouth nor eyes, neither arms nor legs.  How can tian thus create things willfully, constructing them along human lines?  A sign of things that are created spontaneously (ziran) and without willful intent is that they happen without construction, like a human created in the womb upon a mixture of the physical fluids (qi) of a male and female.  In nature, things are created thus, rather than constructed with arms and tools, so how can it be said that  tian willfully creates?  Wang argues that tian is identifiable neither with a body nor with air (both of which are advanced by some). If tian does have a body, it must be very distant from humans, there are no signs for it (Wang offers the seemingly arbitrary “enormous” number of 60,000 li distant).  Surely, if it is this distant, it cannot interact with mankind or be aware of even mankind’s most explicit actions, let alone secret desires and motivations.
In addition to arguing for the implausibility of the divine agency reading of tian, Wang offers an explanation of the psychology which seems all too willing to see agency as rampant in the natural world.  He argues that because people engaged in corrupting action, it was necessary (for rulers) to institute laws, punishments, incitements to proper action, and rewards.  This was attributed to tian rather than to the ruler, who presumably had an interest in fostering a general belief that an omniscient and completely unconquerable divine entity is responsible for enforcing what amounts to the ruler’s laws, rather than the all too human, and thus vulnerable, ruler himself.

c. Astronomy and Physics

Wang’s positions on astronomy and physics were, following his metaphysical positions, naturalistic (with respect to the dominant views of his day), and Wang rejected a number of popular positions on the workings of the sun, planets, and stars.  The following are some representative examples of his views in this area.

i. Celestial Objects

Wang challenges the views he attributes to the ru scholars concerning the origin and movements of the sun.  They claim, according to Wang, that the sun emerges from and descends into the darkness of the yin physical qi, so that the sun literally “goes out” when it sets, subsumed in the yin.  Wang argues that it is not the case that the sun goes out or becomes dark, just as a fire does not become obscured by the darkness when night falls.
Wang argues that the movements of the sun and the moon are connected to the movements of the stars and planets in general, noticing the regularities in the motions of the sun and moon, and their correlation with other movements and placements in the heavens (movement through the zodiac, the planets along the ecliptic, and so forth).  This makes the sun and moon different from the clouds, for example, which move completely independently from the motions of the stars and planets.
The sun, according to Wang, is of the nature of fire, and also has the principle of motion, due to its qi, which is similar to that of the moon and the planets, which are also in motion, while Earth is stationary.  Concerning solar eclipses, Wang’s position is that the sun eclipses spontaneously, arguing against the view that such eclipses are caused by the moon.
While a number of Wang’s views on celestial objects and motion are opposed to our current understandings, his position on the geometry of celestial objects sounds much more modern.  Wang argues that the sun, moon, planets, and stars are not circular even though they appear to be so.  That they appear so is due to their distance.

ii. Heaven and Earth

Heaven (tian) and Earth (di), according to Wang, began small and through time expanded to their current size, via spontaneous growth.  Because of this, Heaven must be far distant from humans (Wang offers a distance of 60,000 li), and for this reason, among others, cannot be said to interact with human beings.
Concerning climate, Wang’s view is that the elements influence the temperature in different areas, and that in the southern regions fire is dominant, while in the northern regions water is dominant.  Heat is caused by proximity to fire, which explains why the southern regions are warmer than the northern, while proximity to water causes things to become cold, which accounts for the lower temperatures in the north.
Wang’s views concerning the source of rain is surprisingly close to our contemporary understanding, and Wang seems to have had some understanding of the water cycle.

6. Ethics

a. Ming (Destiny)

Ming, according to Wang, is the primary determinant of the outcome of a person’s life.  Whether one is successful in one’s career, one has a difficult or easy life full of catastrophes or fortunate turns, whether one is ill or in good health, dies young or in ripe old age--all of this is due to the quality and type of one’s ming.  There are different ming, according to Wang, concerning different aspects of human life.  Thus, there is a ming governing one’s fortunes, a ming governing the length of one’s life, and a ming concerning the welfare of the state, for example.  Wang sees ming not as a metaphysical entity in itself or a power, but as something like a higher-level concept, based on lower-level individuating features ensuring a certain destiny, most often qi.  The fact that there can be different ming might be understood then as flagging the fact that there are different lower-level properties contributing to or somehow responsible for the ming of the entity in question with respect to the property in question (fortune, length of life, talent, and so forth).
This allows Wang to construe ming in a naturalistically respectable way while countenancing its existence and disagreeing with the “common” view of ming as decreed by a divine heavenly agent.  Examples can be seen in the essay Ming yi.  One’s destiny (concerning all aspects) is given by Heaven (spontaneously, rather than consciously), and insofar as this is a natural quality, the destiny of a person regarding different aspects can be revealed in features of their bodies and actions.  The ming concerning length of life, for example, can be seen by examining the physical features of a person.  Some people are sallow, weakly, and frail, and this is an indication that their ming commits them to a (relatively) short life.  Alternatively, those who appear fit and strong can be seen to have a ming allowing them long and healthy lives.
The obvious problem arises here, of course, that it is often the case that the frail live deep into old age and the strong die young.  In fact, in cases of deaths in war, it will generally only be the strong and fit who are killed, and the frail (who stay home rather than fighting) who are spared.  How can this be squared with Wang’s conception of ming?  Wang argues that there are often competing ming, and that one ming might overcome another.  A key example this is the ming of the state.  The ming of the state trumps the ming of the individual, for reasons Wang is not completely clear about.  Some things he says suggests that the view is that the state is a larger, more important, and integrated entity of which the individual is simply a part, and its ming therefore overcomes that of the individual.  A state at war or in chaos, for example, will be one in which young, robust, and strong individuals will often meet their deaths earlier than their individual ming (the one governing their length of life) would otherwise determine.  The ming of the state, or other ming, that is, can interfere with or make irrelevant the individual ming.
To further explain this, in addition to discussing the different entities and aspects ming can attach to, Wang discusses three different types of ming in Ming yi: zheng (regular), sui (contingent), and zao (incidental).  Although he first seems to define these types of ming in such a way as to suggest that they are essentially modal, later in the essay he connects them to specific qualities of outcome, such that one with a regular ming will enjoy a long life and fortune, while one with incidental ming will have a short and likely miserable life, encountering a multitude of misfortunes.  The different types of ming can overcome one another, just as the ming of the state overcomes that of the individual.  Thus, a contingent ming can cancel an incidental ming and vice versa.  Wang is less than fully clear on how this works.  Although he does leave room for willful human activity to change outcomes in one’s life (contingent ming), sometimes the natural features of a situation are so strong that they cannot be overcome by effort or incident.  One example Wang uses is of the doctor being unable to save a person whose allotted life span is up, no matter how hard he may try or how skilled a doctor he may be.

b. Xing (Characteristics)

While Wang’s use of the term xing is broader than the specifically ethical use (he uses it to refer to physical as well as behavioral characteristics), his interesting and more philosophically relevant use of this term is an ethical one.  When he discusses xing as a concept, Wang seems concerned with its ethical aspects.  Wang explains character, like all other phenomena, as being based on the quantity and quality of qi possessed by the individual.  The individual’s destiny (ming) is also a relevant factor in determining character.  In some places, Wang connects these concepts by holding ming to be the determining factor of what kind and how much qi one receives from Heaven, while in other places he seems to make qi the more fundamental concept in connection with character, and takes one’s type of ming to be based in the type or amount of qi one is born with, and completely independent of characteristics (xing). Thus, one born with abundant and strong qi thereby is destined to live a long life, barring circumstantial events that might cut this life short (such as natural disasters, wars, and so forth. connected to the destiny [ming] of the state or the earth, which can supersede individual destiny).  In a number of chapters, Wang argues that one can have a lofty character and at the same time an unfortunate or calamitous destiny.  Observable facts prove this, Wang claims, as there are many talented and virtuous scholars who live lives of suffering and failure and reach early deaths, while untalented and vicious scholars achieve the heights of fame, fortune, and prosperity.  The same is true of rulers and states--there is no causal connection between virtuous rule and ordered or harmonious society, despite the claims of ru scholars.  This is due in part to the lack of connection between the character of a ruler and his destiny.  If a virtuous king has a calamitous destiny, he will be ignored and non-influential, thus his virtue will not translate to the harmonious functioning of society.  Because, according to Wang, destiny is accorded spontaneously, virtue is impotent to transform it. (Zhi chao)
Human action is only in part due to agency, according to Wang, and behavior is determined to a large extent by the situation in society and the world in general.  Moral conduct, for example, is not (fully) attributable to a person’s substantial characteristics (zhi xing), according to Wang, but is mostly dependent on whether or not there is sufficient food, which in turn depends on whether or not there is drought or flooding, and the general state of the climate and land.  Wang claims that when food is sufficient, people will act consistently with ritual and appropriateness (li yi), and the society will be peaceful and orderly.

7. Influence

a. Influences and Place in Han Dynasty Thought

Rafe de Crespigny argues that Wang may have been influenced by Huan Tan, and thereby the Old Text school, thus making sense of his attack on New Text Confucians (although this is mainly speculative).  Wang’s views on qi, tian, ming, and so forth. are clearly influenced by earlier Han and pre-Han thinkers.  Wang claims influence by Confucius, Mencius, Yang Xiong, Dong Zhongshu, as well as Daoist figures such Laozi, although all of these figures are targets of Wang’s criticisms in various places in Lunheng as well.  Interestingly, some of the same stories and accounts of these thinkers Wang uses in some essays to prove their sagehood are used in other essays to undermine their authority or criticize their views more generally.  If Lunheng is taken as unitary and generally representative (assuming that Wang’s views of these philosophers did not change over time), it has to be concluded that he had an ambivalent reaction to these philosophers, seeing them as in some ways exemplary and praiseworthy, while still having (in some cases fatally undermining) flaws.  Indeed, one of Wang’s positions is that later generations should not make the mistake he sees ru scholars making concerning the sages of the past, in assuming that everything they said or taught can be taken as true or even useful, or assuming that everything they did was virtuous or otherwise proper.  Probably for this reason, among others, Wang’s own influence in the Han itself was negligible.

b. Later Influence

Although Wang’s influence in his own time and directly after was almost negligible, and his Lunheng survived mainly because of its perceived interest as an almost encyclopedic collection of historical, mythological, and literary material from early China, Wang’s work did undergo a surge of interest in the modern period, beginning with Qing scholars in the 19th century, who wrote a number of commentaries on the Lunheng, including Yu Yue, Sun Yirang, Yang Shoujing, Liu Bansui, and later Huang Hui.  The resurgence of interest in Wang Chong’s work was likely due to the critical spirit bubbling in the late Qing and into the Republican period, and was maintained through the period of the rise of Marxist materialism.  The critical and seemingly anti-traditional character of Wang’s thought proved amenable to modern thinkers from the late Qing through today.  Since the late 19th century, there have been a number of commentaries and interpretive studies on Wang Chong’s work, mainly in Chinese, Japanese, and Korean scholarship.  Wang’s work was basically unknown in the West until the late 19th century, and since then there has been some level of interest in and scholarship on Wang’s work, mainly historical and philological, and (to a lesser extent) philosophical.

8. References and Further Reading

The amount of work on Wang Chong in English is limited, and much of what does exist is either translation (Forke), or secondary work dealing with Han thought more generally (Loewe, Czikszentmihalyi).  The following list focuses mainly on English language scholarship, but also includes important Chinese works.  Those with facility in the Chinese language are encouraged to start with the more extensive Chinese sources (Zhou, Liu).

  • Chan, Wing-tsit. A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton University Press, 1969.
  • Czikszentmihalyi, Mark. Readings in Han Chinese Thought. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2006.
  • De Crespigny, Rafe. A Biographical Dictionary of Later Han to the Three Kingdoms (23-220 AD). Brill, 2007.
  • Forke, Alfred. Lun Heng: Philosophical and Miscellaneous Essays of Wang Ch’ung (Part I and II). Second Edition.  New York: Paragon Book Gallery, 1962.
  • Lin Lixue, Wang Chong.  Taipei: Sanmin Shuju, 1991.
  • Liu Jinming, Wang Chong zhexue de zai faxian (The Rediscovery of Wang Chong’s Philosophy).  Taipei: Wenjin Chubanshe, 2006.
  • Loewe, Michael. Early Chinese Texts: A Biographical Guide. Berkeley: Institute of East Asian Studies, 1994.
  • Loewe, Michael. Faith, Myth, and Reason in Han China. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2005
  • Makeham, John. Name and Actuality in Early Chinese Thought. Albany: SUNY Press, 1994.
  • McLeod, Alexus. “A Reappraisal of Wang Chong’s Critical Method Through the Wenkong Chapter.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 34:4 (2007).
  • McLeod, Alexus . “Pluralism About Truth in Early Chinese Philosophy: A Reflection on Wang Chong’s Approach.” Comparative Philosophy, 2:1 (2011).
  • Needham, Joseph. Science and Civilization in Early China, Vol. 3.  Cambridge University Press, 1959.
  • Nylan, Michael. “Han Classicists Writing About Their Own Tradition.” Philosophy East and West, 47:2 (1997).
  • Puett, Michael.  “Listening to Sages: Divinations, Omens, and the Rhetoric of Antiquity in Wang Chong’s Lunheng.” Oriens Extremis, 45 (2005-2006): 271-281.
  • Zhou Guidian, Xu shi zhi bian: Wang Chong Zhexue de zong zhi (The Distinction Between Truth and Falsity: The Purpose of Wang Chong’s Philosophy).  Beijing: Renmin Chubanshe, 1994
  • Zufferey, Nicolas, Wang Chong (27-97?): Connaissance, politique et verite en Chine ancienne. Bern: Peter Lang, 1995.


Author Information

Alexus McLeod
University of Dayton
U. S. A.

Wuxing (Wu-hsing)

The Chinese term wuxing (wu-hsing, “five processes” or “five phases”) refers to a fivefold conceptual scheme that is found throughout traditional Chinese thought.  These five phases are wood (mu), fire (huo), earth (tu), metal (jin), and water (shui); they are regarded as dynamic, interdependent modes or aspects of the universe’s ongoing existence and development.    Although this fivefold scheme resembles ancient Greek discourse about the four elements, these Chinese “phases” are seen as ever-changing material forces, while the Greek elements typically are regarded as unchanging building blocks of matter.  Prior to the Han dynasty, wuxing functioned less as a school of thought and more as a way of describing natural processes hidden from ordinary view.  During the period of the Han dynasty (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.), wuxing thought became a distinct philosophical tradition (jia, “family” or “school”).  Since that time, the wuxing system has been applied to the explanation of natural phenomena and extended to the description of aesthetic principles, historical events, political structures, and social norms, among other things.  Cosmology, morality, and medicine remain the chief arenas of wuxing thought, but virtually every aspect of Chinese life has been touched by it.  As such, wuxing has come to be inseparable from Chineseness itself and belongs to no single stream of classical Chinese philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Meanings of Wuxing
  2. Origins of Wuxing
  3. Wuxing Before the Han Dynasty
  4. Wuxing During the Han Dynasty and After
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Meanings of Wuxing

When seeking to understand the wuxing system, we encounter multiple uses of this term in pre-Han and Han sources that may signal the need for more than one translation from Chinese into any differing target language.  We may ask, are we speaking about five elements, five phases, five movements, five actions, or something altogether different?  The truth is that, depending on the use and context, any one of these might be an appropriate translation.

It has become routine in recent decades to insist that, in its cosmological uses, wuxing should be rendered into English as “five phases” rather than “five elements”, and to make a deliberate distinction between the role of these five in Chinese cosmology and the notion of the four elements in Greek thought, according to which the Greek notions of earth, air, fire, water are generally thought to represent actual fixed material substances.  Sometimes wuxing has been translated into English as “five elements”, but when we actually watch the work that xing does in the Chinese language, it is used to describe movement (e.g. walking), alteration, changing states of being, permutations or metamorphoses.  To back translate, then, the Chinese conception of “element” is quite different from the Western one, in that it does not imply a fixed substantial essence that remains unchanged and constitutes the discrete difference between one object and all others. Whereas the four elements in Western Greek thought were understood as the basic building blocks of matter, the Chinese, by contrast, viewed objects as ever-changing and moving forces or energies of five sorts.  These five phases work interactively and have identifiable correlations that instantiate both objects and natural processes as we know them.

2. Origins of Wuxing

Although not developed into its present form until the Han dynasty, the origins of wuxing extend far back into the earliest records of Chinese intellectual history.  In the Shang dynasty (1600-1046 B.C.E.), oracle bone inscriptions (used in divination rituals to predict and discern outcomes in nature and human affairs) rely on the number five.  Typically, this is the pattern of four around a center, where the four represent the cardinal directions expressed in the territories around the central area in which the ruler resides and from which he governs.  But this pattern of five is not yet any comprehensive theory or cosmology, and there is no evidence of belief that some five phases or elements interpenetrate and mutually influence each other correlatively.  However, there are already, in very rough form, associations of the territories with directions, colors, spirits, and proper rituals that are suggestive of the later correlational developments in Han wuxing thought.  For example, in the West an ox of a certain color must be sacrificed at a specified time of a year in order to insure an auspicious future.  Accordingly, even in the Shang there is fragmentary evidence that the number five is of explanatory significance, and there is some preliminary correlative association between territories, colors, rituals, and deities.

3. Wuxing Before the Han Dynasty

Between the Shang and Han dynasties, a number of texts were compiled that collectively shed light on the development of what became wuxing thought.  Chief among these are some of the “Five Classics” alleged to have been written during the Zhou dynasty (1045-256 B.C.E.) and later enshrined as the earliest Confucian canon, although portions of some or all of these texts may well reflect the concerns and contexts of later rather than earlier periods: Shijing (Classic of Poetry), Shujing (Classic of History), Liji (Record of Ritual), Yijing (Classic of Changes), and Chunqiu (Spring and Autumn Annals) with its commentary, Zuozhuan (Chronicles of Zuo).  Despite the uncertain dating, it can be assumed that these texts contain a substantial amount of material that is traceable to the pre-Qin (pre-221 B.C.E.) period and even reaching back to Confucius’s era or before.

In Zuo Zhuan’s record on the 27th year of the reign of Duke Xiang (590-573 B.C.E.), the text says: “Heaven has produced the five elements which supply humankind’s requirements, and the people use them all.  Not one of them can be dispensed with.”  Although English translations of this passage usually say “five elements” and we would expect the Chinese text to say wuxing, actually the text uses wu cai (“five materials” as in “raw materials”).  Accordingly, we may have here good evidence for the antiquity of this passage, because there is no reformatting of the passage to use the character xing as later scholars (who edited these texts into their final form) interested in fostering the wuxing cosmology might have been presumed to have done.  The text is saying that life depends on the ability of the people to understand and use the five raw materials of reality, but it is probably not drawing any significant distinction between xing and cai.

In the 7th year of the reign of Duke Wen (626-609 B.C.E.), the text says: “Water, fire, metal, wood, earth, and grains are called the six natural resources (or treasures) (liu fu).”  The character fu is used for the treasures of nature; the natural resources for life.  This list of six such resources contains the wuxing as we see them in later works, but with the addition of the grains.  Again, we might infer that the text may record authentically pre-Han material and it may reflect rather accurately the fact that the pattern of five as the number of elements had not yet been firmly established in the time of the Zuo Zhuan.

In its remarks on Duke Zhao, 1st year, the Zuo Zhuan says Heaven generates the five tastes (wu wei - sour, sweet, salty, bitter and acrid), five colors (wu se - green, yellow, black, red, and white), and five sounds (wu sheng – corresponding to the Western musical tones mi, so, do, re, and la).  In the passage on Duke Zhao’s 25th year, tastes, colors, and sounds are a result of the wuxing. The wuxing are understood as expressions of Heaven’s patterns (jing), and the character for patterns is the same one later used for the qi (vital energy) meridian lines in the body traced by practitioners of traditional Chinese medicine, suggesting that the wuxing are to Heaven as the qi meridians are to our bodies.

The Zuo Zhuan does not provide an account of correlation and intermingling of the five elements such as we see in later works.  Instead, it puts forward a teaching about five officials (wu guan) who exercise their will in order to arrange the xing into phenomenal reality.  In the material on the Duke of Zhao’s 29th year, the striking question is posed, “Why are there no more dragons?”  The answer provided for the absence of dragons is that each element is directed by its own official, but if the official neglects his task or the persons on earth distort or mismanage the five elements which are the patterns of earth, animals that depend on the order of these patterns will hide and stop reproducing correctly.  The species will disappear.  These officials are presented as spirits or deities which require veneration and offerings to be made to them.  The text gives the name of each official and the element over which he has charge.

The Shujing is a collection of documentary materials related to the ancient history of China.  The fragments that survive are a mixture of myth and history.  The earliest five chapters reach back to the legendary sage emperors Yao and Shun (c. 2400 B.C.E.?), and the last 32 chapters cover the period of the Zhou dynasty down to Duke Mu of Qin (r. 660-621 B.C.E.).  In this work, the chapter entitled Hong Fan (“Comprehensive Order” or “The Order of Everything”) provides an account of how society should follow the patterns of Earth and Heaven.  The first of the nine sections of this chapter is devoted to the wuxing system, indicating that it must be understood before the remaining eight sections can be grasped.  The chapter is constructed in the style of a dialogue between Wu Wang and a sage.  Wu states that he knows human society and that government and relationships must follow the patterns of Heaven, but he wonders how to fully grasp these patterns.  The sage tells him that whenever the wuxing are in disorder, the constant norms of Heaven will disappear and chaos will follow.

We notice now that human behavior can contribute to the harmonious operation of nature, or disrupt it causing chaos and disorder. The moral patterns for humanity and those of the natural cosmos are all interconnected and correlated.  For the first time, each of the elements has its nature more fully explained: water moistens and descends (run xia); fire burns and ascends (yan shang); wood bends and straightens (qu zhi); metal yields and changes (cong ge); earth receives and gives (jia se), such as through seeds and crops.  While fire and water are presented as opposites, wood and metal are not.  Perhaps more interestingly, we notice the correlational mechanisms of the system becoming more obvious.  The five elements are tied to the five tastes: that which moistens and descends produces saltiness; that which burns and ascends produces bitterness; that which bends and straightens produces sourness; that which yields and changes produces pungency; that which seeds and gives crops produces sweetness.  The five elements are correlated to the five ways or powers of a human being: appearance, speech, sight, hearing, and thinking.

Hong Fan does not spell out how the correlations work, only that they exist.  Likewise, in sections two and eight of this chapter, the five elements and the five conducts (also called wuxing) are related.  The sections say that if humans do not behave in the proper manner, they throw the five elements out of harmonious operation, illness and weakness arise in the body and disorder shows up in nature and the human world of history.  But the chapter does not make a direct correlation to explain how an individual element produces an action, as it does when commenting on the five tastes.  Still, the obvious point of a chapter entitled “The Order of Everything” is that a ruler who is not able to order these processes will throw all things into chaos, and even the rains will not come on time.

In Liji, the number of five-set processes of arrangement and change is sixty-two.  These are used as explanations for matters including not only politics, family, and medicine, but colors, seasons, plants, planets, and rituals for performing various actions.  Consider that in wearing ritual vestments of green and eating from vessels of wood (not metal), the sovereign could promote the powers of spring because the associations of the wuxing with various correlates sometimes make some sense (wood, green, spring; or fire, red, summer).

Later, during the Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.), there is evidence of intellectual activity that explicitly concerned wuxing thought as a comprehensive system.  According to the Records of the Historian by Sima Qian (145–90 B.C.E.), beginning in the reign of King Wei (358–320 B.C.E.) and continuing during the reign of King Xuan (319–309 B.C.E.), an intellectual exchange was fostered by convening scholars in the capital city of Linzi next to the Ji Gate, which gave its name to what became known as the Jixia Academy.  Figures named as master teachers in this place include Zou Yan (305–240 B.C.E.), who is considered the systematizer of wuxing cosmology; Zhuang Zhou (Zhuangzi, c. 365–290 B.C.E.), an early Daoist thinker; and both Mengzi (“Mencius,” c. 372–289 B.C.E.) and Xunzi (Hsün-tzu, c. 310-220 B.C.E.), who are among the first interpreters of Confucius’s thought.  If all this is taken as accurate, it is possible that the careers of Mengzi, Zhuang Zhou and Zou Yan could have overlapped at Jixia, and Xunzi might have been there at the same time as a young student before later returning as a master himself.  We are likely on safe ground in concluding that wuxing thought was a subject of the exchanges and debates of figures at Jixia.  There are passages even in the so-called “Inner Chapters” of the Zhuangzi which seem to have wuxing cosmological assumptions underlying them (for example, chapters 2, 6, and 7).

Xunzi is very critical of wuxing explanations and the teachers who are using “ancient lore” to “concoct their new theory” called wuxing.  He calls the theory perverse and bizarre and characterizes it as obscure and impenetrable nonsense.  He is particularly critical of the stream of Confucian thought, found in the tradition of Mengzi, which has appropriated these ideas but is oblivious to where it all goes wildly wrong (Xunzi 16/6/10; Ames and Hall, pp. 137-38).  Xunzi is not making a distinction between wuxing as a cosmological theory and wuxing as a moral doctrine, evidence of which may be seen in the Wuxing pian (Five Modes of Proper Conduct), a text discovered in the tomb of “the tutor of the Eastern palace” at Guodian in China’s Hubei province in 1993, which dates to 300 B.C.E..  Despite Xunzi’s criticims, a wuxing system was growing and extending itself from cosmology to morality, aesthetics, medicine, and so forth.

4. Wuxing During the Han Dynasty and After

During the Han dynasty, one of the most fundamental texts containing material on wuxing theory was the Huainanzi (The Masters of Huainan, 139 B.C.E.).  This text says: “The natural qualities of Heaven and Earth do not exceed five.  The sage is able to use wuxing correctly in order to govern without waste.”  The Huainanzi shows the move to standardize the number five.  It continues to draw out the correlations between wuxing in cosmology and morality, and it extends the medical implications of the system.  Sages who know what to do with the wuxing are able to rule the country, heal patients, and manage the transformations of life and longevity.  It seems that this text conflates Daoist notions of immortals (xian) with those who possess the skill necessary to master the five elements.

Han thinkers used the system to account for an ordered sequence or cycle of change.  For example, in the “mutual production” (xiangsheng) series, wood produced fire, fire produced earth, earth produced metal, metal produced water, and water produced wood.  In the “mutual conquest” (xiangke) series, wood conquered earth, metal conquered wood, fire conquered metal, water conquered fire, and earth conquered water.  If a ruling dynasty’s emblem was water, one might anticipate it being overcome by a dynasty whose emblem was earth.  This schema was appropriated as the Han was thought to rule under the red phase of fire, and their most formidable revolutionary challengers employed this ideology in constructing their movement and its symbols, such as the rebel movement known as the Yellow Turbans (184 C.E.), which attempted to exploit the ideas that red would be conquered by yellow and fire by water.

Although most of its ideas are already evident in the Huainanzi,  the Chunqiu fanlu (Luxuriant Dew of the Spring and Autumn Annals) traditionally ascribed to Dong Zhongshu (179-104 B.C.E.), is a sustained effort to incorporate the wuxing system into Confucian thought, even connecting it to the Confucian five relationships of filiality.  This application was continued in the work of Yang Xiong (53 B.C.E.-18 C.E.), whose text Tai Xuan (The Supreme Mystery, c. 2 B.C.E.) represents an example of Confucian syncretism and appropriation of the wuxing cosmology.  In Baihu tongyi (Comprehensive Discussions in White Tiger Hall, c. 80 C.E.), the record of state-sponsored debates held in 58 C.E., the following explanation for the way a mature son should remain with his parents while a daughter should leave home is given:  “The son not leaving his parents models himself on what?  He models himself on fire that does not depart from wood.  The daughter leaving her parents models herself on what?  She models herself on water which by flowing departs from metal.”

Not all Confucian thinkers accepted the wuxing cosmology or its extended explanatory devices, however.  Wang Chong (27-100 C.E.) was a critic of the theory in its broadest forms, and of the application of it in the realms of natural and physical phenomena, morality, and political history.  In his Critical Essays (Lunheng), he used argument, sarcasm, and what we would call empirical evidence, to criticize the work of Dong Zhongshu and attempt to debunk the evidential basis for the wuxing system.

By the first century B.C.E., Huangdi Neijing (The Yellow Emperor’s Inner Classic), arguably the most significant of the classical Chinese documents on wuxing as related to medicine, attained its final form.  It most likely developed in a lineage of teachers associated with what is now called Huang-Lao (“Yellow Emperor-Laozi”) Daoism, which also influenced portions of the Zhuangzi.  The work has two parts.  The first is the Suwen (Basic Questions), devoted to the wuxing foundation of Chinese medicine and the diagnostic methods for ailments, and the second is the Lingshu (Spiritual Pivots), which is largely concerned with very technical and thorough explanations of acupuncture.  Lingshu 24 has the Yellow Emperor say that the qi energy meridians of the body (jing mai) are divided according to the wuxing and these lines convey energy to the five organs (wu zang) of the body.  The Suwen relies largely on the “mutual conquest” series as the preferred explanatory language for medical ailments and their remedies.  In thinking of the wuxing system related to the body, we must always remember that, in traditional Chinese thought, the body is a microcosm of the universe that recapitulates the patterns of the macrocosm (i.e. Heaven and Earth).  A disease considered energetic or fiery could be overcome by a medicine correlated with cooling associated with water.  Likewise, since wood xing suffuses throughout the spleen and also gives rise to sour flavor, then eating sour foods will increase the wood internally and strengthen the spleen.  Wood is also correlated with the color blue-green, the spring season, the direction east, and the musical note jue (Western mi), and can be increased or conquered based on these correlations.

Medical understandings of wuxing have been applied to non-philosophical arenas, such as astrology.  Chinese astrology relies heavily upon wuxing notions.  Each astrological or zodiac sign is ruled by one or more of the five elements and its yin or yang energies.  According to the lore of Chinese astrology, the signs and energies we are born under impact our entire lives and our personalities.  For example, being born under the wood sign means one is influenced by yang energy.  Such a person is said to be strong and self-reliant.  He is associated with the East, the astrological signs of the Tiger, Rabbit, and Dragon, and the spring season; his health is governed by the condition of his liver and gallbladder; and he both favors and prospers under the colors blue and green.  Similar explanations and prognostications are given for the other four of the five xing as well.

Both military and literary texts in traditional China have incorporated the wuxing system.  The Liu Tao (Six Strategies, also known as Tai Gong’s Six Strategies [for conducting war]), is a well-known tactical manual of ancient China.  It asserts that, by knowing the enemy’s posture with respect to wuxing, one can then, through the “mutual conquest” series, know how to select the attacking phase to defeat him.  Novels such as Xiyou ji (Journey to the West, 16th century C.E.) present main characters in five-phase terms, and the structure of Hong Lou Meng (Dream of the Red Chamber, 18th century C.E.) may be described in terms of wuxing, as Andrew Plaks has shown.

Beyond the world of Chinese texts, traditional Chinese visual arts have embraced wuxing, including the style of painting known by that very name.  This style is a synthesis of traditional landscape painting with wuxing cosmology.  Wuxing painting has a total of five brush strokes, five movements, and five types of composition, each corresponding to the five elements.  The goal of such painting is to create an image harmoniously balanced, often depicting a landscape, but even when not doing so, nevertheless playing on the connection between objects or directions and wuxing.

As wuxing thought has continued to become ever more labyrinthine, the five elements have been incorporated into many arenas of Chinese life, from the way space is arranged (fengshui) to the art of cooking (sweets, sours, bitters, etc).  Having become a distinct philosophical tradition (jia, “family” or “school”) during the Han, wuxing gradually developed into a conceptual device that is used to explain not only cosmology, morality, and medicine, but virtually every aspect of Chinese life and thought.  As such, wuxing has come to be inseparable from Chineseness itself and belongs to no single stream of classical Chinese philosophy.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger T. and David L. Hall, trans.  Focusing the Familiar: A Translation and Philosophical Interpretation of the Zhongyong. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2001.
  • Bodde, Derk.  Chinese Thought, Society, and Science: The Intellectual and Social Background of Science and Technology in Pre-Modern China.  Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1991.
  • Graham, A.C.  Yin-Yang and the Nature of Correlative Thinking.  IEAP Occasional Paper and Monograph Series, No. 6. Singapore: Institute of East Asian Philosophies, 1986.
  • Henderson, John.  “Wuxing (Wu-hsing): Five Phases” in Antonio S. Cua, ed. Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy. New York: Routledge, 2003, 786-88.
  • Major, John S., et. al., trans.  The Huainanzi: A Guide to the Theory and Practice of Government in Early Han China. New York: Columbia University Press, 2010.
  • Needham, Joseph.  Science and Civilisation in China. Vol. 2, History of Scientific Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1956.
  • Plaks, Andrew H.  Archetype and Allegory in the Dream of the Red Chamber. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1976.
  • Porkert, Manfred.  The Theoretical Foundations of Chinese Medicine; Systems of Correspondence. East Asian Science Series, Vol. 3. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1974.
  • Rochat de la Vallee, Elisabeth.  Wuxing: The Five Elements in Classical Chinese Texts.  London: Monkey Press, 2009.


Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.

Individualism in Classical Chinese Thought

“Individualism” is used here to denote inborn and inalienable prerogatives, powers, or values associated with the self and person as found throughout much of the Chinese philosophical tradition. Unlike individualism in modern European and American contexts, Chinese manifestations of “individualism” do not stress an individual’s separation, total independence, and uniqueness from external authorities of power. Rather, individualism in the Chinese tradition emphasizes one’s power from within the context of one’s connection and unity (or harmony) with external authorities of power.  So while both the modern Western and Chinese contexts share a belief that individuals are morally valuable and may attain an outstanding status as such, the Western tradition tends to view the individual in an atomized, disconnected manner, whereas the Chinese tradition focuses on the individual as a vitally integrated element within a larger familial, social, political, and cosmic whole.  Chinese thinkers frequently address issues related to individual value, empowerment, authority, control, creativity, and self-determination, yet they package these crucial aspects of individualism in ways that are generally different from the way individualism has been packaged in the West.

Since the term is not indigenous to China, there is a general scholarly dispute about the relevance and appropriateness of applying the term “individualism” to Chinese philosophy. The inability of mainstream scholarship and discourse to locate and come to terms with native forms of individualism in China has had important ramifications for scholarship, politics, and international relations as well. For example, the current debate about universal human rights is founded on beliefs that individuals can lay claim to certain prerogatives simply by virtue of their existence as individuals. Some Asian polities have used the argument that Asian traditions are not individualistic in order to claim that human rights discourse is not only not universal in scope, but that it is also incompatible with traditional Asian values.

Table of Contents

  1. Dispute over “Individualism” in Chinese Philosophy
  2. The Concept of Autonomy in Chinese Individualism
  3. The Self as Individual
  4. Individualism in Classical Confucian Thought
  5. Moral Autonomy in the Mohist Writings
  6. Individualism in the Zhuangzi
  7. Individualism in the Thought of Yang Zhu
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Dispute over “Individualism” in Chinese Philosophy

Scholars of early Chinese thought such as Chad Hansen, Henry Rosemont, and Michael Nylan have often considered the term “individualism” to be irrelevant or inappropriate for studying Chinese culture and history. Popular perceptions also tend to view Chinese culture as characterized by obligation and duty rather than by individual freedoms. This characterization of Chinese culture as group-oriented rather than individual-oriented helps promote the notion that individualism, especially as it is perceived – as a doctrine that protects individual autonomy against obligations stemming from external, familial or social institutions – is inappropriate for the Chinese context.

Other scholars such as Yu Ying-shih, Donald Munro, Erica Brindley, and Irene Bloom accept the concept of individualism as relevant for the Chinese tradition, at least as a point of discussion. Brindley goes the farthest to contend that by denying individualism in Chinese thought, one effectively ignores the multiple ways in which goals and values for the individual are in fact underscored in the tradition. While Brindley, Yu, and perhaps Bloom readily concede that the term “individualism” stems historically from European and American contexts, they generally agree that this need not limit the term’s usefulness as a tool for understanding concepts relating to the value and powers of the individual in China. For, even in the West, there is no single definition of the term “individual” that has escaped scholarly and public challenge and contestation. Nor does “individualism” always strictly connote one’s uniqueness, separation, and distinction, even in Western usages. Furthermore, the lack of a term or even explicit debate over doctrines of the individual, free will, or autonomy does not mean that Chinese thinkers or even ordinary Chinese people did not imply such things in their writings, or experience them in their lives. Making use of such arguments, scholars of this persuasion therefore assert that one can apply “individualism” to Chinese philosophy to gain rich comparative insights and shed light upon the importance of the integrated individual in Chinese philosophy.

The following analysis of texts and their embedded assumptions and claims serves to draw out possible Chinese forms of individualism that appear to differ considerably from Western forms of possessive individualism, which arose specifically in seventeenth-century English contexts. The latter forms focus on an individual’s possessive claims to uniqueness, and autonomy from surroundings. Chinese forms of individualism, on the contrary, tend to stress an individual’s achievement or fulfillment of some potential from within and in terms of a larger familial, social, and cosmic whole. This concept of individualism does not support a strong sense of autonomy and independence as defined through separation or freedom from others, but rather it reveals the autonomy and independence of the individual as a fully attained and integrated being within a larger web of relationships and authorities.

2. The Concept of Autonomy in Chinese Individualism

The notion of autonomy arguably serves as a distinguishing aspect of any form of individualism. The autonomous agent in many Western discursive models is free from certain external influences. This can be seen in the fact that various individualisms of today generally recast the individual as someone with the potential to be separate and different from his environment and conventional norms. They empower individuals by emphasizing their ability to make decisions and judgments independent of mundane influences and norms in the world.

Early Chinese forms of individualism, on the contrary, do not generally focus on the radical autonomy of the individual; but rather on the holistic integration of the individual with forces and authorities in his or her surroundings (family, society, and cosmos). For early Chinese thinkers, there is no such thing as unfettered autonomy or freedom of will. Rather, early Chinese thinkers posit the existence of a relative and relational sort of autonomy; or, a type of autonomy that grants individuals the freedom to make decisions for themselves, and to shape the course of their own lives to the fullest degree that they can—all from within an intricate system of interrelationships. This type of autonomy grants authority to the individual to fulfill his or her potentials as an integrated individual. The goal of such an individual is to achieve authoritativeness as a person while at the same time duly negotiating influences, commands, and responsibilities that stem from his or her larger environment. Therefore, a crucial back-and-forth tug between the self and the various authorities surrounding it is woven into the very fabric of what it means to be a fully attained, authoritative, empowered, and integrated individual.

3. The Self as Individual

Free from the radical dichotomy between truth/essence and appearance that is characterized by Descartes, the early Chinese “self” is not encumbered by a gross split between mind and body, or between true nature and experience. Rather, the early Chinese “self” is more akin to an organism, which both consists in and emerges out of complex processes occurring inside and outside of it as it interacts with and relates to his or her environment. In such a way, the concepts of self and person are much more integrated than in certain, extreme dualistic Western traditions, as stand in constant and ever-changing relationship to what occurs both within and without.

To the extent that the self is conceived as physical, embodied, and dynamic, the early Chinese “self” necessarily entails a different definition of  “individual.” While there is no clear term in Classical Chinese that might translate consistently into “individual,” this latter term facilitates discussion of those aspects of the self that emphasize its particularity within a whole. We use the term “individual” here to refer to early Chinese notions of self that concern not so much the subjective, psychological sense of “self,” but the qualities of a person that mark him or her as a single, particular entity capable of exerting agency from within a web of relationships. In other words, we refer to the individual not as an atomistic, isolated, and undifferentiated part of a whole, but as a distinct organism that must serve particular functions and fulfill a unique set of relationships in the worlds of which he or she is a part. The individual is thus a unique participant in a larger whole—integral to both, the processes that define the whole, as well as to the change and transformation that stems from itself.

4. Individualism in Classical Confucian Thought

One of the abiding concepts in Chinese philosophy, irrespective of the school of thought, is that of self-cultivation. The Ru, or Confucian lineage, places a premium on the moral cultivation of the individual using a variety of tools and resources, both internal and external. In the Analects of Confucius, the junzi (gentleman, or  nobleman) constitutes the most important ideal for the individual, and any person who strives for such an ideal is to do so by a complicated moral regimen of intense involvement with the rites of the Zhou (dynastic house) and its music; moral education through a morally achieved ruler, master or moral exemplar; and training—involving texts and histories as well as personal resources such as will-power, moral desire, inward reflection and thought, and the active appraisal of how one’s own thoughts and actions compare to those of others.

While one may not wish to call anything mentioned in the Analects “individualism,” it is clear that the individual holds the most valuable key insofar as he or she serves as the locus for self-cultivation and, hence, for the transformation of himself or herself to contribute to a moral society and cosmos. The individual forms the basis upon which authoritative, moral meaning and behavior is to be constructed. Insofar as the individual is considered to be the fundamental site of moral transformation, it is an absolutely crucial element of Confucian thought. So, while the philosophy represented by the Analects does not promote individualism as a moral stance that stresses individual autonomy and freedom from social constraints, it does establish the individual as inherently valuable in the process of moral cultivation, with the potential to be authoritative and fully integrated as a junzi figure within a web of intricate social, political, and cosmic forces. Thus, a type of integrated individualism seems to exist even in the most basic of early Chinese Confucian texts.

The figure whose writings provide us with one of the earliest, and perhaps clearest, representations of early Chinese individualism is Mencius. In the literature prior to Mencius, the individual represents a foundational site for moral cultivation, but the source of one’s moral motivation and insight may stem largely from external authorities. Mencius changes this by appealing to the innate moral agencies of the individual through the concept of xing, (human nature). By naturalizing moral motivation through the concept of xing, Mencius reveals what appears to be a new orientation towards human agency: one that sees the individual body as a universal source of cosmic authority and natural patterns.

Mencius defines sources of moral agency and authority by outlining an internal-external dichotomy and emphasizing the internal resources of the individual in moral cultivation. This is best demonstrated in Mencius 2A2 and the entire Chapter Six, Part A of the text, where Mencius debates with an opponent, Gaozi, over the idea that xing is a source of moral agency and insight. Unlike Mencius, Gaozi advocates the total subordination of the human heart-mind, the seat of a person’s controlling mechanism, the will (zhi), to yan, or what might be translated in the passage as “sayings,” or “teachings.” In such a way, Gaozi declares the absolute necessity of study and discipline through tradition, culture, and other external inputs. Mencius counters this by showing the necessity of stilling one’s heart-mind so that it will allow for its natural, innate moral tendencies to guide the body in correct thinking and behavior.

In another famous debate, Gaozi compares moral refinement to cups and saucers, which have been constructed by man through hard work and external imprinting. His view of moral cultivation strongly denies that an individual’s internal xing could have any moral quality or potential. Mencius responds with an analogy of equal force, describing human xing in terms of water. Just as the flow of water naturally tends downward, he claims, so does human xing naturally move toward goodness. Denouncing Gaozi’s views on the external origins of morality, Mencius insists that only when internal resources such as xing are obstructed, violated, and destroyed through external forces, does immoral behavior arise.

Mencius’ claims integrate the moral motivation of xing with life processes associated with the human body. Taking advantage of a linguistic connection between the terms for “life” and “human nature” in classical Chinese, Mencius argues that the moral agency of xing is intrinsic to basic life processes. To him, moral motivation, rooted in human nature, is inextricably tied to the agency that fills our very lives with health and vitality.

In sum, to Mencius, each individual person is his or her own moral agent by virtue of living properly and healthfully as a human being. By locating the seeds of morality in xing, one’s Heaven-endowed agency for human life, Mencius demonstrates that cultivating oneself morally is tantamount to attaining the proper measures for the basic vital functions of human beings. Mencius therefore not only naturalizes moral agency by making it a universally inherent trait in every individual, he also proposes a radical, physiological claim for a type of individualism that connects proper moral cultivation to the natural growth of one’s inherent xing and life forces.

Mencius is important in the history of Chinese individualism because he grounds ultimate moral authority in the inner, innate resources of the individual. What characterizes Mencius’ form of individualism as a stronger form of individualism than that outlined in the Analects is its emphasis on the human body not merely as a medium of authority or primary locus for the attainment of idealized authority (as exemplified through self-cultivation), but as an individualized source of it as well.

It is noteworthy that all Confucians who postdate Mencius seem to understand xing in terms of powerful, innate tendencies of individuals, but some, like Xunzi, fought vigorously to deny that such tendencies were morally positive. While Xunzi may not be called an individualist in the sense that Mencius may, his thought nonetheless supports a strong notion of individual moral autonomy as represented in the Analects.

5. Moral Autonomy in the Mohist Writings

The early Mohists were famous for their views in social conformity and obedience to political authorities, such as rulers and the Son of Heaven, who abided by the authority of Heaven. There is little that is individualistic about such conformist ideals in a Western sense. However, when one considers that the basis of their views on moral meritocracy and Heaven’s Will are grounded on a fundamental belief in an individual’s rational capacity to know and learn about morality, then the Mohist individual starts to appear much more individualistic than he would at first glance. Indeed, in early Mohist writings, individuals are required to know and choose the morally correct path – that which conforms with Heaven’s Will – on their own. They are thus morally autonomous in two senses: (1) They have the ability to use their rational minds to decipher, come to know, or (in the case of unexceptional commoners and people) at least be tacitly familiar with Heaven’s Will, and (2) They have the ability to choose to conform with what is right.

The early Mohists, who argue explicitly against contemporary beliefs in ming (fate, destiny, derived from Heaven), grant the individual a high degree of control over outcomes in this world. So while the early Mohists do not place extra value or emphasis on the individual or its powers and prerogatives, much less on its self-cultivation, they implicitly grant the individual much agency and control over the course of its life and the type of moral path it wishes to follow. Through their writings one gains insights into the ways in which concepts like conformity may actually go hand-in-hand with beliefs in autonomy and free will.

6. Individualism in the Zhuangzi

The Inner Chapters of the Zhuangzi, generally considered by scholars to have been written by Zhuangzi (or Zhuang Zhou), promote a vision of the individual’s unity with the Dao of Heaven. Whether such a vision is individualistic or not is open to debate. On the one hand Zhuangzi does not explicitly attribute the processes of the Dao to powers inherent in an individual’s body or spirit. Therefore, his writings do not technically fall under the definition of “individualism,” used above when discussing Mencius, which locates the primary source of idealized agency within the mundane individual. In fact, Zhuangzi openly advocates the notion of losing one’s self-identity and sense of self or body in order to fully embrace the agency of Dao. This appears to go against any kind of individualism that might place value on the self.

On the other hand, however, Zhuangzi hopes that every individual might achieve a transcendent self, along with a freedom associated with the transcendent individual. Such freedom – spiritual in nature – is not freedom from a higher source of power, but freedom through it. Insofar as Zhuangzi promotes an ideal of spiritual freedom through individual self-cultivation, his thought is characteristic of the holistic individualism described previously. Individuals are not valued in and of themselves but through their connection with a higher authority or power.  Realized individuals – the goal in Zhuangzian thought – are not unique, autonomous individuals who stand apart from external powers, but unique manifestations of the workings of a shared Dao.

The so-called “Primitivist,” whose writings in the Outer Chapters of the Zhuangzi seem to represent a coherent voice in that text, presents a form of individualism more akin to that described in the Mencius above. Whereas the Inner Chapters expound on a philosophy whose goals appear compatible with individualistic goals, this strand of the Outer Chapters goes further to locate value inside the individual from the beginning, even in an individual’s mundane state.

The primitivist writings uniquely emphasize the idealized powers of xing in every individual, which ultimately link a person with the Dao. Using a strong language of internal-external, the Primitivist denounces morality as an external overlay and unnecessary pollution of internal xing. By recommending that each individual place all of his or her faith in the natural, innate powers of xing, the Primitivist suggests that one can rid oneself of impulses responsible for the creation of cultural and social norms. This results in the reversion of the individual not just back to his or her most basic nature – one that is not coincidentally in accordance with the Dao of the natural world – but a reversion of society to an era of primitive political structures and human interactions as well.

By rejecting the necessity of social structures, institutions, knowledge, technologies, and cultural practices in favor of a cosmic or natural law and power that is accessible through the individual, human body, the proponents of the primitivist ideology share a basic individualistic point of view. Such a view assumes that ultimate value lies in what humans possess innately and in what is naturally accessible to every individual. For the Primitivist, this internal, innate, and universal human agency to interact ideally in the world derives from xing, which is ultimately a part of the natural cycles of the cosmic Dao.

The Primitivist illuminates polarities between what is external and alien or internal and inalienable to a given object. In such a manner he pits knowledge and culture in society against an individual’s personal vitality and innate powers. This naturalizes what is ideal by locating it in the cosmic capacity and authority of an individual’s xing. In the Laozi, a text upon which the Primitivist writing heavily relies, the ruler serves as the main conduit that enables everyone’s individual access to the Dao. Unlike the Laozi, the Primitivist presents a utopian vision that speaks to every individual’s direct, bodily relationship to cosmic power. This difference points to a noteworthy distinction between theocratic conceptualizations of cosmic authority and power as expressed in the Laozi; and biocratic, individualized ones as expressed in the Primitivist ideal.

7. Individualism in the Thought of Yang Zhu

One cannot speak of individualistic movements in early China without at least coming to terms with what we know about Yang Zhu, or Yangzi (c. 4th century B.C.E.), and his legacy. Mencius claimed that Yang Zhu promoted a doctrine of egoism, which the former deemed tantamount to anarchism. Though there is no solid evidence that anything Yangzi may have authored has been transmitted through the ages, we can still gain insight into his views from descriptions and condemnations of his teachings by Mencius and other writers of the slightly later Han period. It is possible that what we have described as primitivist above is nothing more than a strain of thought influenced by Yangist tenets and beliefs.

Yang Zhu, like Mencius, appears to have viewed the self and human body as an important resource for universal, objective forms of authority through xing. We see this through the following quote from Mencius, which states: “Even if he were to benefit the world by pulling out a single hair, he would not do it.” It appears that Yangzi’s so-called egoism is founded on a principle of preserving some aspect of one’s self or body over and above anything else. A later author claims that what Yangzi valued was self in and of itself, while others described his thinking in the following way: “Keeping one’s nature whole, preserving one’s genuineness, and not letting things tire one’s form (body) – these Yangzi advocated but Mencius denounced.” In this example, the self to be valued consists in xing, the body, and in “genuineness” – a vague concept that seems to refer to a spiritual ideal – inherent or original to the individual. Based on such a description, Yang Zhu appears to have idealized certain aspects of the self that help define its essence, whether material, spiritual, or both. By insisting on a sharp separation between that which is internal or associated with the person on the one hand, and external things that might tire it on the other, Yang Zhu joins Mencius in basing his ideals on a fundamental inner/outer distinction. However, his recommendation that one keep the self and its aspects free of outside contamination, if accurate, would constitute an even more extreme form of individualism than what we have encountered with Mencius.

Like Zhuangzi, Yang Zhu (as characterized by later texts that attribute a certain, relatively consistent perspective to his beliefs) seems to have supported the preservation of some essential and vital spirit that is ultimately related to the human body and its wholeness. Unlike Zhuangzi, who wishes for individuals to transcend their own awareness of the boundaries of the self and its materiality, Yang Zhu appears to glorify the existence of these, and to call for the preservation of a strict separation between what is inside and belonging to the sphere of the self, and what is outside and belonging to the sphere of things. Thus, the main distinction between Zhuangzi and Yang Zhu lies in the fact that Yang Zhu appears to value the self as a material body that is sacred precisely because of its essential materiality and life-producing qualities. Zhuangzi, on the other hand, does not directly embrace the cult of bodily vitality. He calls for individuals to transcend their bodies and their materiality so as to embrace what he sometimes refers to as the spirit of the Dao, which should be understood as an ethereal type of vitality.

Given these descriptions of Yang Zhu’s thought, it seems fair to call him an individualist rather than an apologist for selfish egoism. After all, there is no convincing evidence that Yang Zhu promoted selfishness in the sense that he inspired individuals to seek self-profit through the exploitation of public resources or goods. Moreover, there is no clear indication that Yang Zhu tacitly condoned harming or destroying society through his ideals. Rather, most of the reliable evidence points to the fact that Yang Zhu redefined what it meant to value the self in terms of one’s personal, material-spiritual salvation. Indeed, Yang Zhu was perhaps one of the first thinkers, like Mencius, to see xing and the self as a primary source of idealized individual agency and meaning.

Individualism, as has been introduced here, was a broad orientation in early Chinese thought that posited the value and autonomy of the individual and, in some instances, located sources of idealized cosmic power and authority within the individual body. Widespread notions of self-cultivation viewed the individual as the key site of moral or spiritual transformation and, hence, the individual was the primary medium for assimilating social and cosmic authority and order. Early Chinese thinkers also presumed the moral or spiritual autonomy of the individual, granting individuals the power to effect changes in their lives and make important choices concerning morality, self-cultivation, and conformity to external sources of authority. Individualistic authors like Mencius, the Primitivist, and possibly Yang Zhu, went so far as to naturalize cosmic or divine sources of authority in the world by locating them within the human body itself. They thereby made the individual body the primary source for idealized agencies, and valued one’s cultivation of such innate agencies as the highest good.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger, and David L. Hall. “The Problematic of Self in Western Thought,” Thinking from the Han: Self, Truth, and Transcendence in Chinese and Western Culture. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Ames, Roger, Wimal Dissanayake, and Thomas Kasulis, ed. Self as Person in Asian Theory and Practice. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Ames, Roger, Wimal Dissanayake, and Thomas Kasulis, ed. Self as Image in Asian Theory and Practice. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Angle, Stephen. Human Rights in Chinese Thought: A Cross-Cultural Inquiry. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Bauer, Joanne and Daniel Bell, eds. The East Asian Challenge for Human Rights. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Bloom, Irene eds. “Confucian Perspectives on the Individual and the Collective,” Religious Diversity and Human Rights, Irene Bloom, J. Paul Martin, and Wayne L. Proudfoot, 114-151. New York: Columbia University Press, 1996.
  • Brindley, Erica. Individualism in Early China: Human Agency and the Self in Thought and Politics. University of Hawaii Press, 2010.
  • Chan, Joseph. “Moral Autonomy, Civil Liberties, and Confucianism,” Philosophy East and West, 52.3 (2002): 281-310.
  • Chen, Albert H. Y. “Is Confucianism Compatible with Liberal Constitutional Democracy?” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 35.2 (June 2007): 195-216.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mark. Material Virtue: Ethics and the Body in Early China. Leiden: Brill, 2004.
  • Emerson, John. “Yang Chu’s Discovery of the Body,” Philosophy East and West. 46.4 (1996): 533-566.
  • Graham, Angus C. Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1989.
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Author Information

Erica Brindley
The Pennsylvania State University
U. S. A.

Cheng Yi (1033—1107)

Cheng Yi was one of the leading philosophers of Neo-Confucianism in the Song (Sung dynasty (960-1279). Together with his elder brother Cheng Hao (1032-1085), he strove to restore the tradition of Confucius and Mencius in the name of “the study of dao” (dao xue), which eventually became the main thread of Neo-Confucianism. Despite diverse disagreements between them, the two brothers are usually lumped together as the Cheng Brothers to signify their common contribution to Neo-Confucianism.

Cheng Yi asserted a transcendental principle (li) as an ontological substance. It is a principle that accounts for both the existence of nature and morality. He also asserted that human nature is identical with li and is originally good. The way of moral cultivation for Cheng Yi is through composure and extension of knowledge which is a gradual way towards sagehood. These ideas deviate from his brother’s philosophy as well as from Mencius’. They were developed into a school for the study of li (li xue), as a rival to the study of the mind (xin xue), which was initiated by Cheng Hao and inherited by Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529). Cheng Yi’s thought had a great impact on Zhu Xi (1130-1200).

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Ontology
  3. Philosophy of Human Nature, Mind, and Emotion
    1. Human Nature and Human Feeling
    2. The Mind
  4. The Source of Evil
  5. Moral Cultivation
    1. Living with Composure
    2. Investigating Matters
    3. The Relation between Composure and Extension of Knowledge
  6. The Influence of Cheng Yi
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Cheng Yi, a native of Henan, was born into a family of distinguished officials. He used Zhengshu as courtesy name, but was much better known as Yichuan, the river in his home country. Cheng Yi grew up in Huangpo, where his father served as a local administrator. At fourteen, he and his elder brother were sent to study under the tutelage of Zhou Dunyi, the Song Dynasty’s founding father of Neo-Confucianism. At eighteen, driven by a strong sense of duty and concern for the nation, , he memorialized to the emperor a penetrating analysis of the current political crisis as well as the hardships of the common people. In 1056, led by his father, he and his brother traveled to Loyang, the capital, and enrolled in the imperial academy. There they made friends with Zhang Zai, who also eventually became a paragon of Neo-Confucianism.

With an excellent essay, Cheng Yi won the commendation of Hu Yuan, the influential educator, and he gained celebrity status in academia. Young scholars came to study with him from regions far and wide. In 1072, when Cheng Hao was dismissed from his government office, Cheng Yi organized a school with him and started his life-long career as a private tutor. Time and again he turned down offers of appointment in the officialdom. Nonetheless, he maintained throughout his life a concern for state affairs and was forthright in his strictures against certain government policies, particularly those from the reform campaign of Wang Anshi. As the reformers were ousted in 1085, Cheng Yi was invited by the emperor to give political lectures regularly. He did so for twenty months, until political attacks put an end to his office.

At the age of sixty, Cheng Yi drafted a book on the Yizhuan (Commentary on the Book of Changes) and laid plans for its revision and publication in ten years. In 1049, he finished the revision complete with a foreword. He then turned to annotate the Lunyu (Analects), the Mengzi (Mencius), the Liji (Record of Ritual) and the Chunqiu (Spring and Autumn Annals). In the following year he began working on the Chunqiu Zhuan (Commentary on Spring and Autumn Annals). However, in 1102, as the reformers regained control, he was impeached on charges of “evil speech.” As a result, he was prohibited from teaching, and his books were banned and destroyed. In 1109 he suffered a stroke. Sensing the imminent end of his life, he ignored the restriction on teaching and delivered lectures on his book Yizhuan. He died in September of that year.

Apart from the book mentioned above, Cheng Yi left behind essays, poems and letters. These are collected in Works of the Cheng Brothers (Er Cheng Ji), which also carries his conversations as recorded by his disciples. Works of the Cheng Brothers is an amended version of Complete Works of the Two Chengs (the earliest version was published during the Ming dynasty), which includes Literary Remains (Yishu), Additional Works (Waishu), Explanation of Classics (Jingshuo), Collections of Literary Works (Wenyi), Commentary on the Book of Change (Zhouyi Zhuan) and Selected Writings (Cuiyan). Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsi lu) which was compiled by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and Lu Zuqian (1137-1181), also collected many of Cheng Yi’s conversations.

2. Ontology

The concept of li is central to Cheng Yi’s ontology. Although not created by the Cheng brothers, it attained a core status in Neo-Confucianism through their advocacy. Thus, Neo-Confucianism is also called the study of li (li xue). The many facets of li are translatable in English as “principle,” “pattern,” “reason,” or “law.” Sometimes it was used by the Chengs as synonymous with dao, which means the path. When so used, it referred to the path one should follow from the moral point of view. Understood as such, li plays an action-guiding role similar to that of moral laws. Apart from the moral sense, li also signifies the ultimate ground for all existence. This does not mean that li creates all things, but rather that li plays some explanatory role in making them the particular sorts of things they are. Therefore, li provides a principle for every existence. While Cheng Yi was aware that different things have different principles to account for their particular existence, he thought that these innumerable principles amounted to one principle. This one principle is the ultimate transcendental ground of all existence, which Zhu Xi later termed taiji (“great ultimate”) – the unitary basis of the dynamic, diverse cosmos. While the ultimate principle possesses the highest universality, the principle for a certain existence represents the specific manifestation of this ultimate principle. Therefore the latter can be understood as a particularization of the former.

Apparently for Cheng Yi, li is both the principle for nature and that for morality. The former governs natural matters; the latter, human affairs. To illustrate this with Cheng’s example, li is the principle by which fire is hot and water is cold. It is also the principle that regulates the relation between father and son, requiring that the father be paternal and the son be filial.

As the principle of morality, li is ontologically prior to human affairs. It manifests itself in an individual affair in a particular situation. Through one’s awareness, pre-existent external li develops into an internal principle within the human heart-mind (xin). On the other hand, as the principle of nature, li is also ontologically prior to a multitude of things. It manifests itself in the vital force (qi) of yin-yang. The relationship between li and yin-yang is sometimes misconstrued as one of identity or coextensivity, but Cheng Yi’s description of the relationship between the two clearly indicates otherwise.For him, li is not the same thing as yin-yang, but rather is what brings about the alternation or oscillation between yin and yang. Although li and qi belong to two different realms -- namely, the realm “above form” (xing er shang) and the realm “below form” (xing er xia) -- they cannot exist apart from one another. He clearly stated that, apart from yin-yang, there is no dao.

In summary, no matter whether as the principle of nature or that of morality, li serves as an expositional principle which accounts for what is and what should be from an ontological perspective. Therefore, as Mou Zongsan argued, for Cheng Yi, li does not represent an ever producing force or activity, as his brother Cheng Hao perceived, but merely an ontological ground for existence in the realm of nature as well as morality.

3. Philosophy of Human Nature, Mind, and Emotion

a. Human Nature and Human Feeling

Human nature (xing) has been a topic of controversy since Mencius championed the view that human nature is good (xing shan). The goodness of human nature in this sense is called the “original good,” which signifies the capacity of being compassionate and distinguishing between the good and the bad. Cheng Yi basically adopted Mencius’ view on this issue and further provided an ontological ground for it. He claimed that human nature and dao are one, thus human nature is equivalent to li. Human nature is good since dao and li are absolute good, from which moral goodness is generated. In this way Cheng Yi elevated the claim that human nature is good to the level of an ontological claim, which was not so explicit in Mencius.

According to Cheng Yi, all actions performed from human nature are morally good. Presenting itself in different situations, human nature shows the different aspects of li -- namely, humanity (ren), righteousness (yi), propriety (li), wisdom (qi), and trustworthiness (xin). (These five aspects of li also denote five aspects of human nature.) Human beings are able to love since ren is inherent in their nature. When the heart-mind of compassion is generated from ren, love will arise. Nevertheless, love belongs to the realm of feeling (qing) and therefore it is not human nature. (Neo-Confucians tended to regard human feelings as responses of human nature to external things.) Cheng Yi argued that we can be aware of the principle of ren inherent in us by the presentation of the heart-mind of compassion. Loyalty (zhong) and empathy (shu) are only feelings and, thus, they are not human nature. Because of ren, human beings are able to love, be loyal and be empathetic. Nevertheless, to love, in Cheng Yi’s words, is only the function (yong) of ren and to be empathetic is its application.

As a moral principle inherent in human nature, ren signifies impartiality. When one is practicing ren, one acts impartially, among other things. Ren cannot present itself but must be embodied by a person. Since love is a feeling, it can be right or wrong. It may be said that ren is the principle to which love should conform. In contrast to Cheng Hao’s theory that ren represents an ever producing and reproducing force, ren for Cheng Yi is only a static moral principle.

Ren, understood as a moral principle that has the same ontological status as li or dao, is a substance (ti) while feeling of compassion or love is a function. Another function of ren consists in filial piety (xiao) and fraternal duty (ti). These have been regarded by Chinese people as cardinal virtues since the time of the early Zhou dynasty. It was claimed in the Analects that filial piety and fraternal duty are the roots of ren. However, Cheng Yi gave a re-interpretation by asserting that filial piety and fraternal duty are the roots of practicing ren. Again, this shows that for Cheng Yi, ren is a principle, and filial piety and fraternal duty are only two of the ways of actualizing it. When one applies ren to the relationship of parents and children, one will act as filial, and to the relationship between siblings, one will act fraternally. Moreover, Cheng Yi considered filial piety and fraternal duty the starting points of practicing ren.

Having said that ren is substance whereas love, filial piety, and fraternal duty are its functions, it should be noted that according to Cheng Yi the substance cannot activate itself and reveal its function. The application of ren mentioned above merely signifies that the mind and feeling of a person should conform to ren in dealing with various relationships or situations. This is what the word “static” used in the previous paragraph means. Thus understood, ren as an aspect of human nature deviates from Mencius’ perception, as well as the perception in The Doctrine of the Mean (Zhong Yong) and the Commentary of the Book of Change, as Mou Zongsan pointed out. Mou also argued that the three sources mentioned have formed a tradition of understanding dao both as a substance and as an activity. Not surprisingly, Cheng Yi’s view on human nature and li is quite different from his brother Cheng Hao’s.

By the same token, other aspects in human nature such as righteousness, propriety, wisdom and trustworthiness are mere principles of different human affairs. One should seek conformity with these principles in dealing with issues in ordinary life.

b. Mind

The duality of li and qi in Cheng Yi’s ontology also finds expression in his ethics, resulting in the tripartite division of human nature, human mind and human feeling. In Cheng Yi’s ethics, the mind of a human being does not always conform to his nature; therefore a human sometimes commits morally bad acts. This is due to the fact that human nature belongs to the realm of li and the mind and feelings belong to the realm of qi. Insofar as the human mind is possessed by desires which demand satisfaction, it is regarded as dangerous. Although ontologically speaking li and qi are not separable, desires and li contradict one another. Cheng Yi stressed that only when desires are removed can li be restored. When this happens, Cheng maintained, the mind will conform to li, and it will transform from a human mind (ren xin) to a mind of dao (dao xin). Therefore, human beings should cultivate the human mind in order to facilitate the above transformation. For Cheng Hao, however, li is already inherent in one’s heart-mind, and one only needs to activate one’s heart-mind for it to be in union with li. The mind does not need to seek conformity with li to become a single entity, as Cheng Yi suggested. It is evident that the conception of the mind in Cheng Yi’s ethics also differs from that in Mencius’ thought. Mencius considered the heart-mind as the manifestation of human nature, and if the former is fully activated, the latter will be fully actualized. For Mencius, the two are identical. Yet for Cheng Yi, li is identical with human nature but lies outside the mind. This difference of the two views later developed into two schools in Neo-Confucianism: the study of li (li xue) and the study of xin (xin xue). The former was initiated by Cheng Yi and developed by Zhu Xi and the latter was initiated by Cheng Hao and inherited by Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming.

4. The Source of Evil

According to Cheng Yi, every being comes into existence through the endowment of qi. A person’s endowment contains various qualities of qi, some good and some bad. These qualities of qi are described in terms of their being “soft” or “hard,” “weak” or “strong,” and so forth. Since the human mind belongs to the realm of qi, it is liable to be affected by the quality of qi, and evil (e) will arise from the endowment of unbalanced and impure allotments of qi.

Qi is broadly used to account for one’s innate physical and mental characteristics. Apart from qi, the native endowment (cai) would also cause evil. Compared to qi, cai is more specific and refers to a person’s capacity for both moral and non-moral pursuits. Cai is often translated as “talent.” It influences a person’s moral disposition as well as his personality. Zhang Zai coined a term “material nature” (qizhi zhi xing), to describe this natural endowment. Although Cheng Yi adopted the concept of material nature, A.C. Graham noted that the term appeared only once in the works of the Cheng Brothers as a variant for xingzhi zhi xing. Nevertheless, this variant has superseded the original reading in many texts. Cheng Yi thought that native endowment would incline some people to be good and others to be bad from early childhood. He used an analogy to water in order to illustrate this idea: some water flows all the way to the sea without becoming dirty, but some flows only a short distance and becomes extremely turbid. Yet the water is the same. Similarly, the native endowment of qi could be pure or not. However, Cheng Yi emphasized that although the native endowment is a constraint on ordinary people transforming, they still have the power to override this endowment as long as they are not self-destructive (zibao) or in self-denial (ziqi). Cheng Yi admitted that the tendency to be self-destructive or in self-denial is also caused by the native endowment. However, since such people possess the same type of human nature as any others, they can free themselves from being self-destructive or in self-denial. Consequently Cheng Yi urged people to make great efforts to remove the deviant aspects of qi which cause the bad native endowment and to nurture one’s qi to restore its normal state. Once qi is adjusted, no native endowment will go wrong.

As mentioned in the previous section, Cheng Yi maintained that human desires are also the origin of selfishness, which leads to evil acts. The desires which give rise to moral badness need not be a self-indulgent kind. Since they are by nature partial, one will err if one is activated by desire. Any intention with the slightest partiality will obscure one’s original nature; even the “flood-like qi” described by Mencius (Mengzi 2A2) will collapse. The ultimate aim of moral practice is then to achieve sagehood where one will do the obligatory things naturally without any partial intention.

The Cheng brothers wrote, “It lacks completeness to talk about human nature without referring to qi and it lacks illumination to talk about qi without referring to human nature.” Cheng Yi’s emphasis on the influence of qi on the natural moral dispositions well reflects this saying. He put considerable weight on the endowment of qi; nevertheless, the latter by no means playsa deterministic role in moral behavior.

5. Moral Cultivation

a. Living with Composure

For Cheng Yi, to live with composure (ju jing) is one of the most important ways for cultivating the mind in order to conform with li. Jing appeared in the Analects as a virtue, which Graham summarized as “the attitude one assumes towards parents, ruler, spirits; it includes both the emotion of reverence and a state of self-possession, attentiveness, concentration.” It is often translated as “reverence” or “respect.” Hence in the Analects, respect is a norm which requires one to collect oneself and be attentive to a person or thing. Respect necessarily takes a direct object. Cheng Yi interpreted jing as the unity of the mind, and Graham proposed “composure” as the translation. As Graham put it, for Cheng Yi, composure means “making unity the ruler of the mind” (zhu yi). What is meant by unity is to be without distraction. In Cheng Yi’s own words, if the mind goes neither east nor west, then it will remain in equilibrium. When one is free from distraction, one can avoid being distressed by confused thoughts. Cheng Yi said that unity is called sincerity (cheng). To preserve sincerity one does not need to pull it in from outside. Composure and sincerity come from within. One only needs to make unity the ruling consideration, and then sincerity will be preserved. If one cultivates oneself according to this way, eventually li will become plain. Understood as such, composure is a means for nourishing the mind. Cheng Yi clearly expressed that being composed is the best way for a human being to enter into dao.

Cheng Yi urged the learner to cultivate himself by “being composed and thereby correcting himself within.” Furthermore, he indicated that merely by controlling one’s countenance and regulating one’s thought, composure will come spontaneously. It is evident that controlling one’s countenance and regulating one’s thought is an empirical way of correcting oneself within. Such a way matches the understanding of the mind as an empirical mind which belongs to qi. Mou Zongsan pointed out that this way of cultivating the empirically composed mind is quite different from Mencius’ way of moral cultivation. For the latter, the cultivation aims at the awareness of the moral heart-mind, a substance identical with Heaven. Since the mind and li are not identical in Cheng Yi’s philosophy, they are two entities even though one has been cultivating one’s mind for a long time, and what one can hope to achieve is merely always to be in conformity with li.

b. Investigating Matters

To achieve the ultimate goal of apprehending li, Cheng Yi said, one should extend one’s knowledge (zhi zhi) by investigating matters (ge wu). The conception of extending knowledge by investigating matters originates from the Great Learning (Da Xue), where the eight steps of practicing moral cultivation by the governor who wanted to promote morality throughout the kingdom were illustrated. Cheng Yi expounded the idea in “the extension of knowledge lies in the investigation of things” in the Great Learning by interpreting the key words in “the investigation of matters.” The word “investigation” (ge) means “arrive at” and “matters” (wu) means “events.” He maintained that in all events there are principles (li) and to arrive at those principles is ge wu. No matter whether the events are those that exist in the world or within human nature, it is necessary to investigate their principles to the utmost. That means one should, for instance, investigate the principle by which fire is hot and that by which water is cold, also the principles embodied in the relations between ruler and minister, father and son, and the like. Thus understood, the investigation of things is also understood as exhausting the principles (qiong li). Cheng Yi emphasized that these principles are not outside of, but already within, human nature.

Since for every event there is a particular principle, Cheng Yi proposed that one should investigate each event in order to comprehend its principle. He also suggested that it is profitable to investigate one event after another, day after day, as after sufficient practice, the interrelations among the principles will be evident. Cheng Yi pointed out that there are various ways to exhaust the principles, for instance, by studying books and explaining the moral principles in them; discussing prominent figures, past and present, to distinguish what is right and wrong in their actions; experiencing practical affairs and dealing with them appropriately.

Cheng Yi rejected the idea that one should exhaust all the events in the world in order to exhaust the principles. This might appear to conflict with the proposition that one should investigate into each event, yet the proposal can be understood as “one should investigate into each event that one happens to encounter.” Cheng Yi claimed that if the principle is exhausted in one event, for the rest one can infer by analogy. This is possible is due to the fact that innumerable principles amount to one.

From the above exposition of Cheng Yi’s view on the investigations of matters, the following implication can be made. First, the knowledge obtained by investigating matters is not empirical knowledge. Cheng Yi was well aware of the distinction between the knowledge by observation and the knowledge of morals as initially proposed by Zhang Zai. The former is about the relations among different matters and therefore is gained by observing matters in the external world. The latter cannot be gained by observation. Since Cheng Yi said that the li exhausted by investigating matters is within human nature, it cannot be obtained by observation, and thus is not any kind of empirical knowledge.

This may be confusing, but if we compare Cheng Yi’s kind of knowledge to scientific knowledge, things may become clearer. It is important to distinguish between the means one uses to get knowledge, and the constituents of that knowledge. One uses observation as a means to better understand the nature of external things. But the knowledge one gains isn’t observational by nature. It isn’t the sort of knowledge scientists have in mind when they say “objects with mass are drawn toward one another.” It differs in at least two respects: first, the content of one’s knowledge is something we can draw from ourselves, as we have the same li in our nature; second, the knowledge we gain doesn’t rest on the authority of observations. We know it without having to put our trust in external observations, since the knowledge is drawn from inside ourselves. We only need external observation in order to liberate this internal knowledge. So we need it as a means, but no more.

Second, according to Cheng Yi, investigating matters literally means arriving at an event. It implies that the investigation is undertaken in the outside world where the mind will be in contact with the event. Only through the concrete contact with the eventis the act of knowing concretely carried out and the principles can be exhausted.

Third, Cheng Yi believed that through the investigation of matters the knowledge obtained is the knowledge of morals. When one is in contact with an event, one will naturally apprehend the particulars of the event and the knowledge by observation will thus form. Nevertheless, in order to gain the knowledge of morals one should not stick to those concrete particulars but go beyond to apprehend the transcendental principle which accounts for the nature and morals. Thus, the concrete events are only necessary means to the knowledge of morals. They themselves are not constituents of the knowledge in question, as Mou Zongsan argued.

c. The Relation between Composure and Extension of Knowledge

According to Cheng Yi, learning to be an exemplary person (junzi) lies in self-reflection. Self-reflection in turn lies in the extension of knowledge. Also, only by self-reflection can one transform the knowledge by observation into the knowledge of morals. This is possible only if the mind is cultivated in the maintenance of composure. With composure in place, one can apprehend the transcendental principles of events. Cheng Yi made a remark on this idea: “It is impossible to extend the knowledge without composure.” This also explains the role composure plays in obtaining the knowledge of morals by investigating matters.

Contrariwise, obtaining the knowledge of morals can stabilize the composed mind and regulate concrete events to be in conformity with li. Cheng Yi described this gradual stabilization of the mind by accumulating moral knowledge as “collecting righteousness (ji yi).”

Self-reflection for Cheng Yi meant cultivating the mind with composure. However, as mentioned above, the mind cannot be identical with li; it can only conform to it since they belong to two different realms. Since the knowledge obtained by the composed mind comprises the transcendental principles, the knowing in question is a kind of contemplative act. Notwithstanding that, this act still represents a subject-object mode of knowing. On the contrary, the meaning of self-reflection for Mencius reveals a different dimension. The knowledge of morals gained by self-reflection is not any principle which the mind should follow. The knowing is an awareness of the moral mind itself through which its identification with human nature and also with li is revealed. Therefore the object of knowing is not the principle out there (inherent in human nature though) but the knowing mind itself. The awareness thus is a self-awareness. The reflection understood as such is not the cognition per se; it is rather the activation of the mind. In the act of activation, the dichotomy of the knowing and the known diminishes. Moreover, when the mind is activated, human nature is actualized and li will manifest itself. Hence, the mind is aware of itself being a substance, from which li is created. Here Cheng Yi draws upon the distinction between a thing’s substance, understood as its essential and inactive state, and the active state in which it behaves in characteristic ways. Anticipating that his account of the mind will be misread as suggesting that the mind has two parts -- an active and inactive part -- Cheng Yi clarifies that he understands the two parts to be, in fact, two aspects of one and the same thing.

6. The Influence of Cheng Yi

The distinctive and influential ideas in Cheng Yi’s thought can be summarized as follows:

  1. There exists a transcendental principle (li) of nature and morality, which accounts for the existence of concrete things and also the norms to which they adhere.
  2. This principle can be apprehended by inferring from concrete things (embodied as qi) to the transcendental li.
  3. This principle is static, not active or in motion.
  4. Human nature is identical with li, but this should be distinguished from the human mind, which belongs to the realm of qi.
  5. Ren belongs to human nature and love belongs to the realm of feeling.
  6. Moral cultivation is achieved gradually, through composure and the cumulative extension of knowledge.

Cheng Yi had tremendous impact on the course of Confucian philosophy after his time. His influence is most manifest, however, in the thought of the great Neo-Confucian synthesizer Zhu Xi, who adopted and further developed the views outlined above.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Chan, Wing-tsit, trans. Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology Compiled by Zhu Xi and Lu Zu-qian. New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • This contains selections of Cheng Yi’s work in English.
  • Cheng Hao & Cheng Yi. Complete Works of Cheng Brothers (Er Cheng Ji) (in Chinese). Beijing:Zhonghua Shuju, 1981.
    • This is the most complete work of the Cheng Brothers.
  • Graham, A.C. Two Chinese Philosophers: The Metaphysics of the Brothers Ch’êng. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court Publishing Company, 1992.
    • This is the only English monograph on the Cheng Brothers. It provides an in-depth discussion on the philosophy of Cheng Yi. The author also refers to the interpretations made by Zhu Xi.
  • Mou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san). The Substance of Mind and the Substance of Human Nature (Xinte yu xingte) (in Chinese), vol. II. Taibei: Zhengzhong Shuju, 1968.
    • This work is famous for its extraordinary depth and incomparable clarity in the study of Neo-Confucianism of Song and Ming dynasty. It provides a historical as well as philosophical framework to understand various systems of Neo-Confucianism in that period.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. Essentials of Neo-Confucianism: Eight Major Philosophers of the Song and Ming Periods. London: Greenwood Press, 1999.
    • This book on Neo-Confucianism is clearly written and thoughtfully presented. It contains a good summary of Cheng Yi’s thought.
  • Huang, Yong. “The Cheng Brothers’ Onto-theological Articulation of Confucian Values.” Asian Philosophy 17/3 (2007): 187-211.
    • A philosophical discussion on the Cheng Brothers’ ideas of the relations between their ontology and ethics.
  • Huang, Yong. “How Weakness of Will Is Not Possible: Cheng Yi on Moral Knowledge.” In Educations and Their Purposes: Dialogues across Cultures, eds. R.T. Ames and P. Hershock (Honolulu, Hawaii: University of Hawaii Press, 2007), 429-456.
    • This article attempts to bring Cheng Yi’s concept of moral knowledge into the current discourse on weakness of will.

Author Information

Wai-ying Wong
Lingnan University
Hong Kong, China

Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1724—1777)

daizhenDai Zhen, also known as Dai Dongyuan (Tai Tung-yuan), was a philosopher and intellectual polymath believed by many to be the most important Confucian scholar of the Qing (Ch’ing) dynasty (1644-1911 CE). He was also the foremost figure among the sophisticated new class of career academics who rose to prominence in the mid-Qing. A prominent critic of the Confucian orthodoxy of the Song and Ming dynasties (known today in the West as “Neo-Confucianism”), Dai charged his predecessors with philosophical errors that had dire moral consequences for their adherents and brilliantly showed them to be rooted in misreadings of the Confucian classics. Chief among these errors was the tendency to understand feelings and desires as being obstacles to proper moral deliberation and action, a view that Dai saw as opening to the door to frictionless moral judgments, free of calculations of benefit or harm and not responsible to the felt responses of others. Dai aimed to restore feelings and desires to prominence by assigning a central place to sympathetic concern (shu) in moral deliberation. He thus reconceived the fundamental nature of the Neo-Confucian universe in a way that explained moral claims in terms of the human affects. He accomplished this dramatic reconfiguration of the Neo-Confucian thought against the backdrop of social institutions that showed little enthusiasm for, and sometimes outright hostility to, his philosophical endeavors.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Moral Agency
    1. Dai’s Critique of the Neo-Confucian Account
    2. Sympathy as a Form of Moral Deliberation
  3. Human Nature and Moral Cultivation
  4. Metaphysics and Metaethics
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Born in 1724 to a poor cloth merchant of Anhui province, Dai Zhen emerged from an unlikely educational background, attending local schools because his father could not afford the customary private tutorials. By the time Dai was eighteen, however, his genius and scholarly accomplishment had won him the acclaim of his elders and shortly thereafter the backing of a reputable literary scholar in his own clan. Bolstered by a series of endorsements and his own evident academic success, Dai came under the tutelage of the famous classicist Jiang Yong (1681-1762), through whom he became acquainted with many figures in the thriving community of mid-Qing academics. Dai soon proved to be not just a precocious and prolific scholar but a versatile one as well. His 1753 commentary on the Poetry Classic was finished contemporaneously with his first major work in phonology, and both followed closely on the heels of a celebrated treatise in mathematics. Although Dai’s interest in philosophical topics was evident quite early, he did not finish his best-known treatises in this field of intellectual endeavor until late in life, the two most important being On the Good (Yuan Shan) and An Evidential Study of the Meaning and Terms of the Mencius (Mengzi ziyi shuzheng). Between these it is the Evidential Study that is generally regarded as his masterwork, being widely appreciated for its sophistication and rigor. By his own account, hisEvidential Study was his greatest labor of love. Several of the last years of his life were spent writing and revising it, and it is likely that he would have continued to revise the work if it were not for his untimely death 1777.

Dai became a leading figure in the dominant new philological or evidential studies (kaozheng) movement, partly because of his interest in mathematics, calendrical studies, and ancient languages and partly because of his exacting standards of argument. Yet Dais relationship to the philological movement was an uneasy one. Like other philological thinkers, he shared an interest in using hard evidence and careful exegesis to reconstruct the language and practices of the ancients. He also shared with many of them the deep conviction that the orthodox Confucianism of Zhu Xi (1130-1200), which by his time had reigned for several centuries, was thoroughly contaminated with Daoist and Buddhist ideas and needed to be corrected with the tools of evidential scholarship. But Dais contemporaries in philological studies tended to believe that the misreadings and obfuscations of orthodox Confucianism were an inevitable part of theoretical speculation about the meanings and principles (yili) of the classics. For Dai, in contrast, the purpose of evidential studies was to reconstruct the meanings and principlesincluding the ethics and metaphysicsof the Confucian canons ancient authors.

This difference of opinion regarding the study of meanings and principles appears to have led Dai to part with his philological contemporaries in two crucial ways. First, while the professional scholars of his time increasingly valued specialization in certain subfields such as astronomy or geography, Dai nevertheless remained a devoted generalist, seeing all of the various disciplines as potentially working together to reconstruct the often highly theoretical meanings of terms and moral practices contained in the classics. Second, while Dais contemporaries believed it was his contributions in fields such as phonology and mathematics that made him the most formidable scholar of his time, Dai himself believed his greatest contributions to be his treatises on such theoretical topics as human nature, metaphysics, and (especially) moral deliberation and cultivation. In his own lifetime Dais highest accolade was a prestigious position on the staff that compiled the Complete Collection of the Four Treasuries (Sikuquanshu) for the Imperial Librarya collection of classic texts that heavily favoredworks of philological interest. Admirers in Dais own era regarded his treatises on meanings and principles as a monumental waste of time, and most of his early biographers barely mentioned such work, even though it became the central focus of his thought and efforts by the end of his life. But while Dais more speculative labors may have been judged harshly in the mid-Qing, his own appraisal of his work and its importance has been vindicated by later scholars. He has come to be hailed as the foremost representative of Qing dynasty philosophy and is routinely presented as such in surveys of Chinese thought.

2. Moral Agency

a. Dai’s Critique of the Neo-Confucian Account

Dai presents his best-known philosophical work, the Evidential Study, as an indictment of Neo-Confucianism. Of particular concern to him is the reigning orthodoxy of Cheng Yi (1033-1107) and Zhu Xi (1130-1200), whose thought had been deeply embedded in China’s governing institutions for centuries, and whose very moral and metaphysical language had come into popular use. At the heart of Dai’s critique is an array of worries about the Neo-Confucian picture of moral agency, where acting well is conceived primarily as a matter of freeing certain native, spontaneous instincts from the influence of feelings and desires. Of particular concern to Dai is the view that merely by eliminating or paring away such feelings and desires one can somehow become a good moral agent. As Dai sees it, this view neglects not just the deliberative, non-spontaneous work that one must do in order to act well, but also the crucial role that affects should play in those deliberations. Thus his critique is aimed in particular at the idea that our native instincts, once freed of the influence of our feelings and desires, are somehow “complete and self-sufficient”—adequate by themselves to give proper moral guidance (Evidential Study, ch. 14, 27).

In Dai’s view, this Neo-Confucian account is factually wrong, and as such does profound injustice to the role that education and cultivation should have in the development of the moral understanding. If we see our work in moral self-cultivation as primarily subtractive or eliminative—as a matter of overcoming bad feelings and desires so as to let the refined parts of the nature act of their own accord—then, Dai maintains, it makes no sense to think of moral education as contributing to the growth and maturation of the moral understanding. What we learn in the process of study (xue) might be understood as having instrumental value, helping to free us from the grip of our bad dispositions and realize the dormant moral sensibilities in ourselves, but once that is accomplished the content of our knowledge would seem to play noconstitutive part in moral comprehension. It is this demotion of education to mere instrument that the erudite Dai Zhen finds to be deeply mistaken. When we learn from the classics, he argues, they have a transformative effect on the faculty of the understanding (xinzhi), helping it to see the morally salient features of one’s life more clearly and respond more appropriately (ch. 14). Just as the nourishment of food and water actually becomes a part of the thing it is meant to nourish, he maintains, so too do the contributions of one’s education become, in a psychological analogue to digestion, a part of the understanding (ch. 9, 26).

Dai is particularly troubled by the pernicious effects the Neo-Confucian account has on its adherents—and, after centuries of Neo-Confucian orthodoxy, on popular culture as well. When the account is strictly followed, he argues, it does not allow the feelings of others to have the right kind of purchase on our own moral evaluations and judgments. If the principal work of moral action lies in eliminating meddlesome emotions, Dai argues, then our deliberations could not be informed by personal acquaintance with the feelings of others (the kind we get from imagining ourselves asthe other person, which is presumably distinct from the kind we get by inferring merely from general rules or observational data). The sentiments stirred by such an acquaintance would be seen as interfering with the authentic expression of the good natural instincts within oneself. Left unchecked by a proper understanding of the felt responses of others, however, Dai maintains that a person’s moral conclusions are at best subjective “opinions” (yijian) and not what Dai calls “invariant norms” (buyi zhi ze)—so named because they represent views that could under ideal circumstances attain a kind of universal agreement across all times and places (ch. 4, 42). In several remarkable passages, Dai writes movingly about the abuses of power that such a doctrine would condone when adopted by those in a position to impose their decisions on the weak or institutionally disadvantaged, unconstrained by the feelings of the helpless people most affected by such decisions (ch. 5, 10).

Another pernicious feature of the Neo-Confucian account, and for Dai Zhen the most alarming one, is that it prevents proper consideration of benefits and harms from figuring in one’s moral deliberations. This problem inspires Dai’s most passionate remarks, as he notes repeatedly how the Neo-Confucian view would blind its adherents to the detrimental effects of their own actions. Unable to consult their desires, he argues, moral agents would have no practicable way of discerning what really matters to the well-being of others (nor, he hints, would they even be capable of recognizing what would or would not contribute to their own well-being). Combined with the first worry, about the inability of others’ claims to suitably inform one’s own personal deliberations, this leaves agents in what Dai describes as “a state of profound blindness,” unable to know what behaviors qualify as good and incapable of being alerted to their mistakes by others (ch. 4). When the doctrine of native self-sufficiency is deeply embraced, Dai concludes, “its harm is great, and yet no one is able to be aware of it” (ch. 43).

b. Sympathy as a Form of Moral Deliberation

Dai Zhen’s corrective for the shortcomings of the Neo-Confucian view (and its Daoist and Buddhist forebears) is an emotional attitude known as “shu,” whose meaning for Dai most closely approximates what we might call “sympathy” or “sympathetic concern.” The characteristic way of exercising shu, for Dai, is to imagine oneself in another’s shoes and so ask what one might desire if one were that person. By reconstructing another person’s desires one can better appreciate the extent to which certain states of affairs would benefit or harm that person. Dai assumes that some simulation of desires (and resultant feelings) is necessary to take proper account of potential benefits and harms, and he insists that the desire-averse picture of moral action upheld by the Neo-Confucians rules out such an exercise from the start. Thus he concludes that the Neo-Confucian picture is unable to fulfill what he takes to be a fundamental demand of any viable account of moral deliberation.

Not just any exercise of shu will provide reliable information about human well-being. For Dai, as for most other Confucian thinkers, shu can be done well or poorly. Given the rather cerebral form of moral cultivation Dai advocates, he believes that most moral agents need a great deal of education before they can make truly informed judgments. Even with this caveat in mind, however, Dai’s critics and occasionally his admirers have often constructed accounts of shuthat make it all too easy to dismiss.

One temptation for those whose intuitions are driven by the English word “sympathy” is to see Dai as advocating an exercise in mirroring or replicating the psychological states of others, especially their desires. If this were the case, shu would seem a poor indicator of the mirrored person’s well-being, since the person may well want things that are bad for her. But in fact Dai’s account of shu leaves it open to the moral agent to simulate counterfactual psychological states. Strictly speaking, Dai understands shu as the act of “taking oneself and extending it to others” (ch. 15), leaving it to the agent to judge which states would be the appropriate ones to synthesize.

A more common temptation is to say that Dai advocates bringing whatever desires we happen to have into our sympathetic reconstruction of the other’s point of view. If I am a solitary type of person, presumably, then I am to imagine others with the same preference for solitude. But this interpretation leaves Dai vulnerable to the charge of sympathetic paternalism, whereby one reconstructs another’s point of view on the basis of affective predispositions that are not the other’s. If this is how shu is supposed to work, then it would again seem a flawed measure of well-being, for others might benefit a great deal more from friendship and company than I, for instance.

The problem with this reading is that it assigns shu no critical role in selecting the desires that are to be synthesized. Just as the first interpretation depicts shu as naïvely mirroring or replicating the wants of another, the second depicts it as naïvely adopting one’s own wants, with no regard to whether these are true indicators of the other’s well-being. In fact, there is considerable evidence that Dai Zhen, at least in his more cogent moments, understands shu as being much more selective than either of these models would suggest. More than just imagining others with the same desires that one happens to have, Dai also sees shu as helping to identify the desires that really matter for welfare in the first place, which he understands as the desires that contribute to “life” (sheng) or “the fulfillment of life” (sui sheng). These are the basic desires which, upon sufficient reflection, we find that we all share—a common core that belong to what Dai sometimes characterizes as “the ordinary human feelings” (ren zhi changqing) and more often describes as the “true feelings” (qing) (ch. 5). In using shu, Dai suggests, one finds similarities that cut across distinctions in power or position: “If one genuinely returns to oneself and reflects on the true feelings of the weak, the few, the dull, the timid, the diseased, the elderly, the young, the orphaned, or the solitary, can those [true feelings] of these others really be any different from one’s own?” (ch. 2).

While there is evidence to suggest that Dai sees shu as having a robust role in selecting desires, it is less clear what the precise mechanism of selection is supposed to be. Possibly the very exercise of constructing a new point of view is supposed to help free one of the clutter of one’s own misguided or excessively idiosyncratic predilections. And Dai probably sees the special care or concern for a person inherent in shu as drawing attention to the desires that really matter to her, much in the way that grief or love draw attention to the features of a person to which the griever or lover is most attached. Dai also hints that there should be some sort of comparative exercise in shu, where one reconstructs the emotional reactions of others and measures them against those that one would have oneself under similar circumstances.

However Dai understands shu to work in detail, he is emphatic about its use as a form of moral deliberation. So understood, Dai suggests, it relies upon our desires in ways incompatible with the Neo-Confucian account of moral agency. His criticisms point to at least two such ways. First, proper moral action as Dai conceives of it requires that we use our desires in the process of deliberation. Second, it requires that we have a certain baseline of dispositions to want the right things. In other words, moral deliberation requires that we “have desires” both in an occurrent sense (as when I am described as actively feeling some inclination to eat good food) and in a dispositional sense (as when I am described as the kind of person who wants good food, even if I am presently working on an essay and not thinking about food at all). Thus, Dai’s picture of moral agency conflicts with the Neo-Confucian account not just in how it envisions moral deliberation but also in its conception of the kind of person that a good moral agent should be. Dai maintains that good human beings should have robust dispositions to desire beneficial things, which in turn requires that they have a healthy interest in their own well-being or life-fulfillment. Without the desire to “fulfill one’s own life,” Dai contends, one will “regard the despairing conditions of others with indifference” (ch. 10). Dai thus unabashedly asserts that even self-interested desires should figure prominently in the life of the virtuous moral agent.

3. Human Nature and Moral Cultivation

Like most Confucian philosophers, Dai Zhen shows a great deal of interest in the moral proclivities of human nature, a topic which by his time had long taken its bearings from Mencius’ (391-308 BCE) famous claim that the natural dispositions are good, and Xunzi (310-219 BCE) equally renowned polemic against this Mencian view. Although Dai is not alone in taking up this particular debate between Mencius and Xunzi, it nevertheless presents him with an important opportunity to sort through an apparent tension in his work, for it is Mencius that Dai takes to speak with final authority, and yet many of Dai’s own views carry an undisguised debt to Xunzian thinking about the relationship between nature, agency, and self-cultivation. Unlike most major figures who have weighed in on the Mencius-Xunzi debate, then, Dai has an interest in confirming much of Xunzi’s position while showing with great care and nuance how Xunzi’s views can be rendered compatible with the thesis that human dispositions are good by nature.

The parts of Xunzi’s doctrine that resonate most deeply with Dai Zhen concern the need to reshape the natural dispositions. If they are already more or less good, Xunzi reasons, it is hard to see why we would need an education that in any meaningful way transforms them. Our nature would already provide adequate or nearly adequate resources for moral self-improvement. Furthermore, Xunzi is plausibly read as upholding a picture of moral cultivation where the heart-and-mind must often overrule the desires, directing the body to act in ways contrary to the tug of one’s felt inclinations.

Like Xunzi, Dai is particularly concerned to develop a picture of the natural dispositions that would countenance a transformative account of self-cultivation. After all, one of the centerpieces of his philosophical work is a critique of the Neo-Confucian account of cultivation as merely subtractive or eliminative—as helping us to remove the bad parts of our nature, but forming no constitutive part of the cultivated self. Dai also shares with Xunzi the presupposition that this transformation requires some sort of power by the heart-and-mind to overrule the desires, and even uses language nearly identical to Xunzi’s to describe the mechanism of control—likening the heart-and-mind to the ruler (jun) of the body in that it issues orders of “permission or denial” (ke fou) to act on the desires of the latter (ch. 8). Thus Dai believes both that our dispositions begin in need of a great deal of reshaping and that one’s heart-and-mind must often resist the pull of the natural dispositions in order to reshape it.

One can consistently maintain this view while upholding the doctrine of natural goodness, Dai thinks, simply by acknowledging that there are parts of one’s nature that are not manifest in the raw, pre-cultivated state. Dai recognizes (as is now routinely observed) that much of Xunzi’s argument depends on a narrow understanding of “nature,” by which anything that appears before the deliberate activity of moral education is considered natural, and anything that appears afterwards is a product of human artifice. But Dai insists that one’s nature consists of latent capacities as well, potentialities which may not always be immediately manifest but which could nevertheless be said to be part of one’s nature, or in one’s nature, as the potential to grow into a peach tree is in the pit of a peach (ch. 25, 29).

In saying this, Dai takes himself to be making a much stronger and more capacious claim than one might think, for if human beings have in their nature the potential to become good, Dai believes, then this happy outcome could be brought about only by building upon nascent goodness, or virtues, already in existence. In other words, if we are to be capable of both understanding the good and being motivated by it, then we must already have some germ of moral understanding and some ability to delight in the good, even if these moral buds have no discernable effect on our behavior. This is because, as Dai puts it, moral inquiry and study are to one’s moral capacities as the nutritive powers of food and drink are to the material endowments of the body: one cannot use them to nurture or grow their intended objects unless some budding form of that object already exists (ch. 26).

This particular move in Dai’s argument might seem controversial. It assumes, after all, that the operations of moral inquiry and study really are like the nurturing of something that already exists, and not, for example, like the procreation or generation of something entirely new. But underlying this argument is a larger commitment to a picture of moral education as always building on some prior ability to appreciate the relevant norms, and it may have been this commitment that in the end makes the Xunzian account of the natural dispositions untenable in Dai’s eyes. For Dai, even at the earliest stages one learns by drawing upon one’s pre-existing grasp of propriety (li) and righteousness (yi), enlarging and expanding upon the understanding that one already has. In contrast, for Xunzi (as Dai reads him), those who aspire to goodness must start from scratch, without the benefit of nascent tendencies to appreciate the good (ch. 25-26).

4. Metaphysics and Metaethics

Most accounts of Dai Zhen’s place in the history of Chinese philosophy focus on his contributions to the ongoing dispute about the ontological status of li (pattern, principle) and qi (vital energy, material force), the two things most often proposed as the fundamental constituents of the universe in later Confucian metaphysics. Neo-Confucians such as Zhu Xi were arguably dualists about li and qi, acknowledging that the two could not exist apart from one another, but also seeing them as mutually irreducible. By contrast, Dai’s treatises seek to explain away the phenomena and the canonical terminology that strike so many of his predecessors as referencing irreducible notions of li, often by recasting them as references to the cyclical movements of yin and yang, or as particular arrangements of emotions or material bodies—all of these being typically understood as qi-based phenomena. Dai never declares himself a monist about qiin any unambiguous way,but he nevertheless devotes himself to showing how conceptions of the former should be explained in terms of the latter, and he is now frequently cited for the philological ingenuity and argumentative creativity that he brought to bear against Zhu Xi’s dualism.

As the great synthesizer of Neo-Confucian thought, Zhu Xi understands li as the cosmological patterns or principles that both make a thing the kind of thing it is (e.g., a human being rather than a goat) and determine the norms to which a thing should conform (e.g., serving one’s family, being of sound mind, and so on). Proper accounts of a thing’s kind and its norms should, Zhu believes, ultimately appeal to these patterns, not to the endowment of qi—the stuff that makes up one’s body and embodied feelings and desires—that a thing happens to have. Zhu understands li both as patterns that belong to the cosmos as a whole and, as Dai is fond of pointing out, as formless things that somehow exist inside all concrete individuals, including the heart-and-mind of every human being. These internalized li are, for Zhu, the “parts” or “manifestations” (fen) of the cosmological li, which implies in turn that the patterns belonging to each concrete individual are produced by (and thus harmonize with) the patterns that govern Heaven and Earth.

Dai Zhen’s trenchant criticism of the metaphysical picture offered by Zhu and other Neo-Confucians is that they wrongly took li and qi to be “two roots” (er ben)—that is, they mistakenly saw li as being “rooted” separately from qi (ch. 19). This critique encapsulates two general sorts of errors that he finds in the thought of his Neo-Confucian predecessors. The first is their tendency to see li as being separately “rooted” in the sense of having independent causal power. For example, Dai never embraces the view that the liare somehow responsible for making an individual thing the kind of thing it is. If li have anything to do with distinguishing between kinds, he maintains, it is simply because they represent the fine-grained features of things that we use to identify what kind they are, not the causal agent that makes them what they are (ch. 1). Similarly, he takes issue with the Neo-Confucian assertion that there is some li-based cosmological force that gives rise to qi’s tendency to fluctuate between two extremes (yin and yang). For Dai, the term for this purported cosmological force, known from the Classic of Change as “extreme polarity” or “taiji,” simply describes or names the fundamental oscillation in the cosmic qi. It is not a distinct force that makes the qi move as it does (ch. 18).

The second sense in which Dai’s predecessors see li as separately “rooted” is in conceiving of it as having independent explanatory power, such that one could give an adequate account of li without appealing to qi. The consequences of this sort of error are most apparent in moral claims. For Zhu Xi, to say that someone’s behavior is virtuous or good is to say that it is a proper expression of the li in her, which means in turn that it is a proper expression of some natural endowment of patterning imbued in her heart-and-mind by Heaven. Dai sees this as the wrong sort of story to tell, not just because it presupposes the existence of an unlikely causal agent (the formless “li” of the individual heart-and-mind), nor because he rejects the view that our Heavenly-endowed nature is predisposed in some small way to recognize and delight in the good (in fact, Dai seems to accept some version of this picture). Rather, Dai sees it as mistaken because it has nothing to do with why such behavior is good. Dai’s own preferred account invokes not the proclivities of Heaven as a basis for moral claims, but instead the proper arrangement of such worldly qi-based things as emotional dispositions and desires. Things are in accordance with their proper patterns, Dai asserts, when “the feelings do not err” (ch. 2).

Ever the attentive classicist, Dai traces much of the confusion he finds in the Neo-Confucian usage of “li” to a subtle misreading of the Confucian canon. In the Confucian classics, Dai notes, when the term “li” is used in its moral sense it tends to refer to the state of things when they are patterned in the right way, or “well-ordered” (tiao li) (ch. 1). Thus to speak of the “li” of something (e.g., a person, a boat) is not to refer to some formless object in that thing, but simply to the perfected state of that thing. The Neo-Confucians run afoul of this original sense of the word in assuming that “li” must denote something like an actual object, existing in esse. In so doing, Dai suggests, they open the door to a very different explanation of how someone becomes a “li” or “well-ordered” version of herself, where what makes her well-ordered is not simply that she has improved upon her feelings and desires in the right way, but that some quasi-object in her has expressed itself in the right way. For Dai, in contrast, it is enough to think of li as the state of things as they ought to be:

The exhaustive grasp of human li is nothing but an exhaustive grasp of what is imperative (biran) in human relations and daily affairs, and that is all. “What is imperative” is to push something to its greatest limit, where it can no longer be altered, and this is to speak of its perfection, not to trace out its root. (ch. 13)

5. Influence

At the time of Dai Zhen’s death he was widely revered for his scholarship in such fields as mathematics and phonology but ignored or dismissed as a philosopher. Among his contemporaries, the best-known admirers of his work on metaphysics and ethics were Hong Bang (1745-1779) and Zhang Xuecheng (1738-1801), though their admiration had little impact on other scholars of the era. Dai’s most successful student and friend, Duan Yucai (1735-1815), wrote a biography of Dai in which he dutifully reported his teacher’s profound devotion to and enthusiasm for his less popular philosophical works. But Duan never shared that enthusiasm and himself worked on conventional philological issues.

Only in the late nineteenth and early twentieth century were Dai’s On the Good and Evidential Study taken up with much interest, notably by reform-minded thinkers such as Zhang Taiyan (1868-1936), Liu Shipei (1884-1919), and Liang Qichao (1873-1929), who were particularly drawn to Dai’s suggestion that Cheng-Zhu thought countenanced abuses of power unchecked by the feelings and desires of the disadvantaged or powerless. Later, with the rise of Marxist thought in China, Dai’s attack on Neo-Confucian li—and his concomitant interest in explaining phenomena in terms of qi—made his work a convenient centerpiece for sweeping narratives about the decline of “idealism” and rise of “materialism” in the Ming and Qing dynasties. To some extent this preoccupation with Dai’s place in the li-qi debate lingers in the literature today, although scholars have increasingly turned to focus on his moral philosophy in its own right. Throughout the last two centuries, Dai has remained one of the chief sources of inspiration to those Confucian scholars who find Song and Ming Confucianism to be unviable or fundamentally contaminated with Daoist and Buddhist concepts. As such, he continues to be regarded as one of the most prominent internal critics of the Confucian tradition today.

6. References and Further Reading

Although the study of Dai Zhen’s life and work has become a minor cultural industry in the last couple of decades, there is still relatively little published material that focuses primarily on his philosophy, and even less that is accessible to those unfamiliar with the exegetical disputes prominent in his day. Readers are encouraged to begin with Feng Youlan and Philip J. Ivanhoe (below), and to make use of general surveys of the history of Chinese philosophy.

  • Chin, Ann-ping, and Freeman, Mansfield. Tai Chen [Dai Zhen] on Mencius: Explorations in Words and Meanings. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
    • A widely available summary of Dai’s life and thought, with a complete if not always careful translation of Dai’s most important philosophical work, the Evidential Study.
  • Ewell, John W. Reinventing the Way: Dai Zhen’s Evidential Commentary on the Meanings of Terms in Mencius (1777). Berkeley: Ph.D. dissertation in history, 1990.
    • Includes the strongest of the available English translations of Dai’s Evidential Study.
  • Feng Youlan [Fung Yu-lan]. A History of Chinese Philosophy,volume II. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • An English translation of this well-known scholar’s monumental survey of history of Chinese philosophy. The portion devoted to Dai Zhen is replete with ample quotations from Dai’s works.
  • Hu Shi. Dai Dongyuan de zhexue (The Philosophy of Dai Dongyuan). Reprinted in Taipei: Taiwan Shangwu, 1996.
    • An important and thorough if somewhat dated introduction to Dai Zhen’s philosophy and his place in Qing dynasty academics. This edition also includes the full texts of Dai’s On the Goodand Evidential Study,as well as several of his letters.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. “Dai Zhen.” In Confucian Moral Self Cultivation, 2nd ed. (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 2000): 89-99.
    • The best introduction to Dai Zhen’s moral thought in the English language. This work also exhibits the rare virtue (in Dai Zhen studies) of being accessible to those less familiar with classical Chinese language and Neo-Confucianism.
  • Lao Siguang. Xin bian zhong guo zhe xue shi (History of Chinese Philosophy, new edition). Taipei : San min shu ju, 1981.
    • A view of Dai Zhen from one of his more strident critics, presented as the final chapter of a survey of Chinese philosophy. Lao uses little charity in attempting to understand Dai, but his is one of the very few lengthy studies that focuses primarily on the philosophical content of Dai’s views.
  • Nivison, David S. “Two Kinds of ‘Naturalism’: Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng.” In The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy, ed. Bryan Van Norden (Chicago: Open Court, 1996): 261-82.
    • Nivison’s contribution to the academic “cottage industry” in studies of Dai’s influence on Zhang. Like most such studies, this piece is primarily an exercise in intellectual history, but Nivison’s passing summaries of Dai’s views are careful and insightful.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. “Mencius, Xunzi, and Dai Zhen: A Study of the Mengzi ziyi shuzheng.” In Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2002): 216-241.
    • An overview of Dai Zhen’s masterwork. This piece is particularly helpful in sorting out Dai’s several ways of understanding the doctrine that human nature is good.
  • Tiwald, Justin. “Dai Zhen on Human Nature and Moral Cultivation.” In the Dao Companion to Neo-Confucian Philosophy, ed. John Makeham (Dordrecht [Netherlands]: Springer, 2009): Ch. 20.
    • An extended overview and analysis of Dai’s ethics.
  • Yu Yingshi. Lun Dai Zhen yu Zhang Xuecheng (On Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng). Taipei: Dong da tu shu gu fen you xian gong si, 1996.
    • Originally published in 1976, this is one of the best Chinese language works on Dai Zhen’s philosophical life and writings, although the focus is on Dai’s influence on Zhang Xuecheng and Qing dynasty academics.

Author Information

Justin Tiwald
San Francisco State University
U. S. A.

Romanization Systems for Chinese Terms

Originally, the Chinese language and its many dialects did not use any form of alphabetical writing to express the meanings and sounds of Chinese characters. As Western interest in China intensified during the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, various systems of romanization (transliteration into the Roman alphabet used in most Western languages) were proposed and utilized. Of these, the most frequently used today are the pinyin system and the Wade-Giles system. Both are based on the pronunciation of Chinese characters according to “Mandarin,” used as the official language of government in both the People’s Republic of China (mainland China) and the Republic of China (Taiwan).

The Wade-Giles system prevailed in both China and the West until the late twentieth century, at which point the pinyin system (developed in the People’s Republic of China during the 1950s) began to gain adherence among journalists and scholars. Today, the most current scholarship tends to use pinyin renderings of Chinese terms. For this reason, the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy introduces the names of Chinese philosophical concepts and figures in pinyin romanizations, with the exception of Wade-Giles forms that appear in bibliographical entries. The difference between the two systems can be compared by examining the renderings of some common Chinese philosophical terms according to each:

Pinyin Wade-Giles English Translation
Dao Tao Way, path
de te virtue, moral force, power
jing ching classic, scripture
junzi chün-tzu gentleman, profound person
ren jen benevolence, humaneness
Tian T’ien Heaven, nature
ziran tzu-jan spontaneity, naturalness

The following table may be used to convert pinyin and Wade-Giles romanizations:

Pinyin Wade-Giles Pronounce As-
b p b as in "be," aspirated
c ts', ts' ts as in "its"
ch ch' as in "church"
d t d as in "do"
g k g as in "go"
ian ien
j ch j as in "jeep"
k k' k as in "kind," aspirated
ong ung
p p' p as in "par," aspirated
q ch' ch as in "cheek"
r j approx. like "j" in French "je"
s s, ss, sz s as in "sister"
sh sh sh as in "shore"
si szu
t t' t as in "top"
x hs sh as in the "she" - thinly sounded
yi I
you yu
z ts z as in "zero"
zh ch j as in "jump"
zi tzu

Author Information

Jeffrey L. Richey
Berea College

Cheng Hao (Cheng Mingdao, 1032—1085)

Cheng_HaoCheng Hao, also known as Cheng Mingdao, was a pioneer of the neo-Confucian movement in the Song and Ming dynasties, which is often regarded as the second epoch of the development of Confucianism, with pre-Qin classical Confucianism as the first, and contemporary Confucianism as the third. If neo-Confucianism is to be understood as the learning of li (conventionally translated as “principle”), then Cheng Hao and his younger brother Cheng Yi can be regarded as the true founders of neo-Confucianism, as with them li came to be regarded as the ultimate reality of the universe for the first time in Chinese history . Cheng Hao’s unique understanding of the ultimate reality is that it is not some entity but rather is the “life-giving activity.” This understanding strikes a similar tone to Martin Heidegger’s Being of beings which was created almost a millennium later. Assuming the identity of li and human nature, Cheng Hao argues that human nature is good, since what is essential to human nature is humanity (ren), also the cardinal virtue in Confucianism, and this is nothing but this life-giving activity. A person of ren is the one who is in one body with “ten thousand things” and therefore can feel their pains and itches just as one can feel them in one’s own body. This is an idea central to the whole idealist school (xinxue, learning of heart-mind) of the neo-Confucian movement, a movement culminating in Wang Yangming.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Principle
  3. Goodness of Human Nature
  4. Origin of Evil
  5. Moral Cultivation
  6. Influence
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Cheng Hao was born in Huangpi of the present Hubei Province in Mingdao Year 1 of Emperor Ren of the Song dynasty (1032) and so is also called Mr. Mingdao. He and his younger brother Cheng Yi (1033-1107) are often referred to as “the two Chengs” by later Confucians. Growing up, the brothers moved quite often as their father, Cheng Xiang, was appointed as a local official in various places. In 1046, his father became acquainted with Zhou Dunyi (1016-1073), one of the so-called “five Confucian masters” of the Northern Song. He sent Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi – who themselves turned out to be the other two of the five masters – to study with Zhou for about a year. In 1057, after passing the civil service examination, Cheng Hao followed in his father’s footsteps and started his own career as a local official, culminating in his initial participation in (1069) and eventual withdrawal from (1070) the reform movement led by Wang Anshi (1021-1086). Cheng Hao returned to Luoyang after 1072 and continued to assume a few minor official positions, but he spent most of his time studying and teaching Confucian classics together with his brother. During this period, the brothers also had frequent discussions with the final two of the five masters, Shao Yong (1011-1077) and Zhang Zai (1020-1077). The former was their neighbor in Luoyang, and the latter was their uncle.

Cheng Hao’s philosophical ideas are largely developed in conversations with his students, many of whom recorded his sayings. In 1168, Zhu Xi (1130-1200) edited some of these recorded sayings in Chengs’ Surviving Sayings (Yishu) in 25 volumes, in which 4 volumes are attributed to Cheng Hao and 11 volumes to Cheng Yi. The first 10 volumes are sayings by the two masters, where in most cases it is not clearly indicated which saying belongs to which brother. In 1173, Zhu Xi edited Chengs’ Additional Sayings (Waishu) in 12 volumes, including those recorded sayings circulated among scholars and not included in Yishu (in most cases, it is not indicated which saying belongs to which Cheng). As Zhu Xi himself acknowledged that the authenticity of sayings in this second collection is mixed, it should be used with caution. Before Zhu Xi edited these two works, Yang Shi (1053-1135), one of the common students of the two Chengs, rewrote some of these sayings in a literary form in The Purified Words of the Two Chengs (Cuiyan). However, it mostly represents Cheng Yi’s views. Cheng Hao’s own writings, mostly official documents, letters, and poetry, are collected in the first four volumes of Chengs’ Collected Writings (Wenji). In addition, Cheng Hao wrote a correction of the Great Learning, which is included in Chengs’ Commentary on Classics (Jingshuo). All of these are now conveniently collected in the two volume edition of Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng Ji) by Zhonghua Shuju, Beijing (1981).

2. Principle

What is called neo-Confucianism in Western scholarship is most frequently called lixue, or the learning of li (commonly translated as “principle”), in Chinese scholarship. Lixue refers to neo-Confucianism in the Song and Ming (and sometimes Qing) dynasties. However, although “neo-Confucianism” was originally used to translate lixue, it is now sometimes understood more broadly than lixue to include Confucianism in the Tang Dynasty which preceded it. Cheng Hao and his younger brother Cheng Yi can be properly regarded as the founders of neo-Confucianism as the learning of principle. Although Shao Yong, Zhou Dunyi, and Zhang Zai are often also treated as neo-Confucians in this sense, it is in Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi that li first becomes the central concept in a philosophical system. Cheng Hao makes a famous claim that “although I have learned much from others, the two words tian li are what I grasped myself” (Waishu 12; 425). Tian is commonly translated as “heaven,” although it can also mean “sky” or “nature.” By combining these two words, however, Cheng Hao does not mean to emphasize that it is a principle of heaven or a heavenly principle but simply that heaven, the term traditionally used to refer to the ultimate reality, is nothing but principle (see Yishu 11; 132), and so tian li simply means “heaven-principle.” As a matter of fact, not only tian, but many other terms such as “change” (yi), dao, shen (literally “god,” but Cheng Hao focuses on its meaning of “being wonderful and unfathomable” ), “human nature” (xing), and “lord” (di) are all seen as identical to principle. For example, Cheng Hao claims that “what the heaven embodies does not have sound or smell. In terms of the reality, it is change; in terms of principle, it is dao; in terms of its function, it is god; in terms of its destiny in a human being, it is human nature” (Yishu 1; 4). “Tian is nothing but principle. We call it god to emphasize the wonderful mystery of principle in ten thousand things, just as we call it lord (di) to characterize its being the ruler of events ” (Yishu 11; 132). He even identifies it with heart-mind (xin) (Yishu 5; 76) and propriety (li). Because Cheng Hao thinks that all these terms have the same referent as principle, his philosophy is often regarded an ontological monism.

From this it becomes clear in what sense Cheng Hao claims that he grasps the meaning of tian li on his own. After all he must be aware that not only the two words separately, tian and li, but even the two words combined into one phrase, tian li, had appeared in Confucian texts before him. So what he means is that principle is understood here as the ultimate reality of the universe that has been referred to as heaven, god, lord, dao, nature, heart-mind, and change among others. In other words, with Cheng Hao “principle” acquires an ontological meaning for the first time in the Confucian tradition. Thus Cheng Hao claims that “there is only one principle under heaven, and so it is efficacious throughout the world. It has not changed since the time of three kings and remains the same between heaven and earth” (Yishu 2a; 39). In contrast, everything in the world exists because of principle. Thus Cheng Hao claims that “ten thousand things all have principle, and it is easy to follow it but difficult to go against it” (Yishu 11; 123). In other words, things prosper when principle is followed and disintegrate when it is violated. One of the most unique ideas of Cheng Hao is that ten thousand things form one body, and he tells us that “the reason that ten thousand things can be in one body is that they all have principle” (Yishu 2a; 33).

While principle is the ontological foundation of ten thousand things, Cheng Hao emphasizes that, unlike Plato’s form, it is not temporally prior to or spatially outside of ten thousand things. This can be seen from his discussion of two related pairs of ideas. The first pair is dao and concrete things (qi). After quoting from the Book of Change that “what is metaphysical (xing er shang) is called dao, while what is physical (xing er xia) is called concrete thing” (Yishu 11; 119), Cheng Hao immediately adds that “outside dao there are no things and outside things there is no dao” (Yishu 4; 73). In other words, what is metaphysical is not independent of the physical; the former is right within the latter. The second pair is principle (dao, human nature, god) and vital force (qi). In Cheng Hao’s view, “everything that is tangible is vital force, and only dao is intangible” (Yishu 6; 83). However, he emphasizes that “human nature is inseparable from vital force, and vital force is inseparable from human nature” (Yishu 1; 10), and that “there is no god (shen) outside vital force, and there is no vital force outside god” (Yishu 1; 10).

What does Cheng Hao precisely mean by principle, which is intangible and does not have sound or smell? Although translated here as “principle” according to convention, li for Cheng Hao is not a reified entity as the common essence shared by all things or universal law governing these things or inherent principle followed by these things or patterns exhibited by these things. Li as used by Cheng is a verb referring to activity, not a noun referring to thing. For example, he says that “the cold in the winter and the hot in the summer are [vital forces] yin and yang; yet the movement and change [of vital forces] is god” (Yihsu 11; 121). Since god for Cheng means the same as li, li is here understood as the movement and change of vital forces and things constituted by vital forces. Since things and li are inseparable, as li is understood as movement and change, all things are things that move and change, while movement and change are always movement and change of things. Things are tangible, have smell, and make sound, but their movement and change is intangible and does not have sound or smell. We can never perceive things’ activities, although we can perceive things that act. For example we can perceive a moving car, but we cannot perceive the car’s moving. In Cheng Hao’s view, principle as activity is present not only in natural things but also in human affairs. Thus, illustrating what he means by “nowhere between heaven and earth there is no dao” (Yishu 4; 73), Cheng points out that “in the relation of father and son, to be father and son lies in affection; in the relation of king and minister, to be king and minister lies in seriousness (reverence). From these to being husband and wife, being elder and younger brothers, being friends, there is no activity that is no dao. That is why we cannot be separated from dao even for a second” (Yishu 4; 73-74). Cheng makes it clear that the principle that governs these human relations is such activity as affection and reverence.

However, in what sense can li as activity be regarded as the ontological foundation of things, as activity is not self-existent and has to belong to something? For Cheng Hao, li is a special kind of activity. To explain this, Cheng Hao appeals to the idea of the unceasing life-giving activity (sheng sheng) from the Book of Change. Commenting on the statement that “The unceasing life-giving activity is called change” in the Book of Change, Cheng Hao argues that “it is right in this life-giving activity that li is complete” (Yishu 2a; 33). So li is the kind of activity that gives life. It is indeed in this sense of life-giving activity that Cheng Hao regards dao and tian as identical to li, as he claims that “because of this [the unceasing life-giving activity] tian can be dao. Tian is dao only because it is the life-giving activity” (Yishu 2a; 29). Thus, although life-giving activity is always the life-giving activity of ten thousand things, ten thousand things cannot come into being without the life-giving activity. It is in this sense that the life-giving activity of ten thousand things becomes ontologically prior to ten thousand things that have the life-giving activity. This is quite similar to Martin Heidegger’s ontology of Being: while Being is always the Being of beings, beings are being because of their Being.

3. Goodness of Human Nature

Since for Cheng Hao, human nature (xing) is nothing but principle destined in human beings, and since principle is nothing but life-giving activity (sheng), this life-giving activity is also human nature. It is in this sense that he speaks approvingly of Gaozi’s sheng zhi wei xing, a view criticized in the Mencius. By sheng zhi wei xing, Gaozi means that “what one is born with is nature.” Mencius criticizes this view and argues that human nature is what distinguishes human beings from non-human beings, which according to him is the beginning of four cardinal Confucian virtues: humanity (ren), rightness (yi), propriety (li), and wisdom (zhi). When Cheng Hao claims that what Gaozi says is indeed correct, however, he does not mean to disagree with Mencius. On the contrary, he endorses Mencius’ view in the same passage where he approves Gaozi’s view. This is because Cheng Hao has a very different understanding of sheng in sheng zhi wei xing than Gaozi does. For Gaozi, sheng means what one is born with, while for Cheng Hao it is the life-giving activity, which is the ultimate reality of the universe. So for Gaozi the phrase says that what humans are born with is human nature, but for Cheng Hao it means that the life-giving activity is human nature. This is most clear because Cheng Hao quotes this saying of Gaozi together with the statement from the Book of Change that “the greatest virtue of heaven and earth is the life-giving activity” and then explains this statement in his own words: “the most spectacular aspect of things is their atmosphere of life-giving activity” (Yishu 11; 120).

To understand human nature as the life-giving activity, it is important to see the actual content of human nature for Cheng Hao: “These five, humanity, rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness, are human nature. Humanity is like the complete body and the other four are like the four limbs” (Yishu 2a; 14). So his view of human nature is basically the same as Mencius, except he adds the fifth component, faithfulness. Since these five components of human nature are also five cardinal Confucian virtues, Cheng Hao talks about “virtuous human nature” (dexing) and “virtue of human nature” (xing zhi de): “ ‘virtuous nature’ indicates the worthiness of nature and so means the same thing as goodness of human nature. ‘Virtues of human nature’ refers to what human nature possesses” (Yishu 11; 125). To illustrate the goodness of human nature, Cheng Hao highlights the importance of humanity (ren), regarding it as the complete human nature that includes the other four components, because “rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness are all humanity” (2a; 16-17). For Cheng, humanity is precisely the life-giving activity. In the same passage in which he affirms Gaozi’s saying, after stating that “the atmosphere of life-giving activity is most spectacular,” Cheng Hao further makes it clear that it is humanity that continues the life-giving activity: “ ‘what is great and originating becomes (in humans) the first and chief (quality of goodness).’ This quality is known as humanity” (Yishu 11; 120). Thus, for Cheng Hao, humanity is not merely a human virtue. It is actually no different from the life-giving activity. Just like heaven, dao, god, and lord, it is indistinguishable from principle (li) as the ultimate reality.

Understood as life-giving activity, it becomes clear why human nature, which can be illustrated by humanity (as it includes other components of human nature) is good. In Cheng Hao’s view, this sense of life-giving activity that humanity (ren) has is best explained by doctors when they refer to a person who is numb as lacking ren: “doctors regard a person as not-ren when the person cannot feel pain and itch; we regard a person as lacking humanity when the person does not know, is not conscious of, and cannot recognize rightness and principle. This is the best analogy” (Yishu 2a; 33). A person whose hands and feet are numb cannot even feel the pain of oneself, to say nothing of that of others. In contrast, “a person of humanity will be in one body with ten thousand things” (2a; 15). This means that a person of humanity, a person who is not numb (lacking ren) is sensitive to the pain of other beings, not only human beings but also non-human beings, in the same way that one is sensitive to one’s own pain.

A difficulty in understanding Cheng Hao’s view of human nature is that he sometimes seems to think that not only good but also evil can be attributed to human nature and principle. About the former, he states that, “while goodness indeed belongs to human nature, it cannot be said that evil does not belong to human nature” (Yishu 1; 10). About the latter, he says that “it is tian li that there are both good and evil in the world” (Yishu 2a; 14) and “that some things are good and some things are evil” (2b; 17). In both cases, however, Cheng Hao does not mean that evil belongs to human nature or principle in the same way as good belongs to human nature, and so what he says in these passages is not inconsistent with his view of human nature as good. As for evil belonging to human nature, Cheng Hao uses the analogy of water. Just as we cannot say muddy water is not water, so we cannot say the distorted human nature is not human nature. Here Cheng Hao makes it clear that water is originally clear, and human nature is originally good. That is why in the same passage in which he says that evil cannot be said not to belong to human nature, he emphasizes that Mencius is right in insisting that human nature is good. So goodness inherently belongs to human nature, while evil is only externally attached to and therefore can be detached from human nature, just as clearness inherently belongs to water, while mud is only externally mixed in and therefore can be eliminated from water (Yishu 1; 10-11). In the two passages in which Cheng Hao states that it is li or tian li that there are both good and evil people, Cheng does not mean that heaven or principle as life-giving activity is both good and evil. In such contexts, Cheng Hao means something different by li and tian li. It does not mean heaven or principle but means something similar to what Descartes sometimes called “natural light.” What he says in these passages is then that it is natural or naturally understandable (tian li) that there are good people and there are bad people. The question then is why it is natural or naturally understandable to have both good people and evil people when human nature is purely good.

4. Origin of Evil

Cheng Hao holds the view that human nature is good and yet thinks it natural that there are both good people and evil people. To explain this, like many other neo-Confucians, Cheng Hao appeals to the distinction between principle and vital force (qi). While the ideas of both principle (li) (to which human nature is identical) and vital force (qi), appeared in earlier Confucian texts, it is in neo-Confucianism that these two become an important pair. In Cheng Hao’s view, “it is not complete to talk about human nature without talking about qi, while it is not illuminating to talk about qi without talking about human nature” (Yishu 6; 81). It is common among neo-Confucians to regard human nature as good and to attribute the origin of evil to the vital force. In this respect Cheng Hao is not an exception. Cheng Hao claims that it is natural that there are good people and evil people precisely because of vital force. Thus, in the same passage in which he uses the analogy of water, after claiming that human nature and vital force cannot be separated from each other, he states that “human life is endowed with vital force, and therefore it is naturally understandable (li) that there are good and evil (people)…. Some people have been good since childhood, and some people have been evil since childhood. This is all because of the vital force they are endowed with” (Yishu 1; 10). Then he uses the analogy of water. Water is the same everywhere, but some water becomes muddy after flowing a short distance, some becomes muddy after flowing a long distance, and some remains clear even when flowing into the sea. The original state of water is clear; whether it remains clear or becomes muddy depends upon the condition of the route it flows. The original state of human nature is good; whether a person remains good or becomes evil depends upon the quality of the vital force the person is endowed with.

There is an apparent problem, however, with this solution to the problem of the origin of evil. Cheng Hao argues that what constitutes human nature is not only present in human beings but also in all ten thousand things. Thus, after explaining the five constant components of human nature – humanity, rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness – Cheng Hao points out that “all ten thousand things have the same nature, and these five are constant natures” (Yishu 9; 105). Cheng Hao repeatedly claims that ten thousand things form one body. In his view, this is “because all ten thousand things have the same principle”; human beings are born with a complete nature, but “we cannot say other things do not have it” (Yishu 2a; 33). Thus Cheng Hao argues that horses and cows also love their children, because the four beginnings that Mencius talks about are also present in them (Yishu 2b; 54). In other words, in terms of nature, there is no difference between human beings and other beings. The difference between human beings and other beings lies in their ability to extend (tui) the principle destined in ten thousand things (to extend the natural love beyond one’s intimate circle), and the difference in this ability further lies in the kind of vital force they are respectively endowed with. Thus Cheng Hao argues that “Humans can extend the principle, while things cannot because their vital force is muddy” (Yishu 2a; 33). Here, he emphasizes that the vital force that animals are endowed with is not clear. In contrast, “the vital force that human beings are endowed with is most clear, and therefore human beings can become partner [with heaven and earth]” (Yishu 2b; 54). In addition to this distinction between clear and muddy vital forces, Cheng Hao also claims that the vital force that humans are endowed with is balanced (zheng), while the vital force that animals are endowed with is one-sided (pian). After reaffirming that human heart-mind is the same as the heart-mind of animals and plants, he says that “the difference between human beings and other beings is whether the vital force they are respectively endowed with is balanced or one-sided [between yin and yang]. Neither yin alone nor yang alone can give birth to anything. When one-sided, yin and yang give birth to birds, beast, and barbarians; when balanced, yin and yang give birth to humans” (Yishu 1; 4; see also Yishu 11; 122).

Cheng Hao thus makes precisely the same distinction between good people and evil people as he makes between human beings and animals. The apparent problem here would seem to be that evil people would then be indistinguishable from animals since they are both endowed with turbid, one-sided, and mixed vital force, as Cheng Hao does often regard evil people as beasts. However, the problem is rather: since Cheng Hao believes that animals cannot be transformed into human beings because their endowed vital force is turbid, one-sided, and mixed, how can he believe, as he does, that evil humans who are also endowed with such turbid, one-sided, and mixed vital force can be transformed into moral beings and even sages? In other words, what is the difference between evil humans and beasts that makes the difference?

Cheng Hao seems to be aware of this problem, and he attempts to solve it by making the distinction between host vital force (zhu qi) and alien or guest vital force (ke qi). For example, he states that “rightness (yi) and the principle (li) on the one side and the alien vital force on the other often fight against each other. The distinction between superior persons and inferior persons is made according to the degree of the one conquered by another. The more the principle and rightness gain the upper hand…the more the alien vital force is extinguished” (Yishu 1; 4-5). For human beings, the host vital force is the one that is constitutive of human beings, which makes human being a bodily existence, while the guest vital force is constitutive of the environment, in which a human being, as a bodily existence, is born and lives. This distinction between host and alien vital force is equivalent to the one between internal (nei qi) and external vital force (wai qi) that his brother Cheng Yi makes, and therefore the analogy the Cheng Yi uses to explain the latter distinction can assist us in understanding the former distinction. For Cheng Yi, the internal vital force is not mixed with but absorbs nourishment from the external vital force. Then he uses the analogy of fish in water to explain it: “The life of fish is not caused by water. However, only by absorbing nourishment from water can fish live. Human beings live between heaven and earth in the same way as fish live in water. The nourishment humans receive from drinking and food is from the external vital force” (Yishu 15; 165-166).

In this analogy, a fish has both its internal or host vital force, the vital force that it is internally endowed with, which accounts for its corporeal form, and its external or guest vital force, the vital force it is externally endowed with, which provides the environment in which fish can live. This analogy performs the same function as Cheng Hao’s own analogy of water (mentioned above). Water itself is a bodily being with a nature and internal vital force, both of which guarantee its clearness. However, water has to exist in external vital force (river, for example). If this external vital force is also favorable, the water will remain clear, but if it is not favorable, the water will become muddy. In this analogy, water is equivalent to human beings, and “the clearness of water is equivalent to the goodness of human nature” (Yishu 1; 11). Through such an analogy, Cheng Hao attempts to show that, in addition to human nature, humans are endowed both internally with the host vital force, which is constitutive of human body, and externally with the alien vital force, which makes up the natural and social environment in which humans live. Therefore, not only is human nature all good, but the host vital force constitutive of human beings is also pure, clear, and balanced. Neither of the two can account for human evil. However, since human beings are corporeal beings, they must be born to and live in the midst of external vital force, which can be pure or impure. It is the quality of this external or guest vital force, purity or impurity, and the way people deal with it, that distinguishes between good and evil people. If the external vital force is also pure, it will provide the necessary nourishment to the internal vital force and therefore the original good human nature will not be damaged, and people will be good. If the external vital force is turbid and human beings living in it have not developed immunity to it, their internal vital force will be malnourished or even polluted and the original good human nature will be damaged, and people will be evil.

Thus, in Cheng Hao’s view, although both evil people and animals are endowed with muddy, mixed, and one-sided vital force, evil people are endowed with it externally as the necessary environment in which they have to live, while animals are endowed with it internally as constitutive of their bodily existence. In other words, such muddy, mixed, and one-sided vital force is the external guest vital force for human beings but is the internal host vital force for animals. Since the host vital force constitutive of animals – the vital force that makes animals animals – is muddy, mixed, and one-sided, animals can never be transformed into moral beings. On the other hand, since the host vital force constitutive of evil people, just as that constitutive of good people, is originally pure, clear, and balanced, but is only later polluted by muddy, mixed, and one-sided alien vital force, they can be made to become good by clearing up the pollution. Here, just as muddy water, when purified, does not enter into a state it has never been in before but simply returns to its original state of clearness, so an evil person, when made good, does not become an entirely new being, but simply returns to its original state of goodness (Yishu 1; 10-11). A return to this original state requires moral cultivation.

5. Moral Cultivation

Cheng Hao’s distinction between the host vital force and guest vital force makes a great contribution to the solution of the problem of the origin of evil. At least this is a step further than simply appealing to the distinction between principle and vital force. Still it is hard to say that it is completely successful, as it seems to attribute the origin of evil entirely to the external environment, which is also suggested by Mencius in his analogies of the growing of wheat (Mencius 6a7) and the Niu Mountain (Mencius 6a8). Some scholars believe such a view is implausible, and even both Cheng Hao and Mencius think that an evil person is also responsible for becoming bad. However, neither of them provides a satisfactory explanation about the internal origin of evil. Perhaps their very idea of the original goodness of human nature prevents such an explanation, just as Xunzi’s idea of the original badness of human nature perhaps prevents him from a satisfactory explanation of the origin of goodness: Xunzi does appeal to the transformative influence of sages and their teaching as a solution to the problem, but then he faces the problem of the origin of sages as their nature, as he claims, is also evil.

Whether Cheng Hao’s solution to the problem of the origin of evil is satisfactory or not, it is undeniable that one can become evil even though his or her nature is good. So Cheng Hao emphasizes the importance of moral cultivation. Since evil occurs when the turbid external vital force pollutes one’s originally clean internal vital force, just as the dust and dirt in the river makes the originally clear water muddy, what is needed is to purify the contaminated internal vital force, just as the turbid water must settle to become clear. This process is called cultivation of the vital force (yang qi) in Mencius. When the internal vital force is cultivated to the utmost, it becomes as clear, bright, pure, and complete as it is in its original state. This is also what Mencius calls “flood-like” vital force (haoran zhi qi), and so Cheng Hao puts a great emphasis on the passage of the Mencius in which Mencius talks about the cultivation of this flood-like vital force (Yishu 11; 117). Cheng Hao claims that “the flood-like vital force is nothing but my own [internally endowed] vital force. When it is cultivated instead of being harmed, it can fill between heaven and earth. Once it is blocked by private desires, however, it will immediately become withered” (Yishu 2a; 20). In other words, Mencius’ flood-like vital force is what everyone is originally internally endowed with, and everyone should cultivate it in case it gets contaminated by the turbid external vital force.

How does one cultivate the flood-like vital force? Cheng Hao claims that it does not come from outside. Rather it results from “consistent moral actions (jiyi)” (Yishu 2a; 29 and Yishu 11; 124). So jiyi becomes the way to cultivate the flood-like vital force. Thus, commenting on the passage in which Mencius talks about the flood-like vital force, Cheng Hao points out that, “cultivated straightly from dao and along the line of principle, it fills up between heaven and earth. [Mencius says that] ‘it is to be accompanied with rightness and dao,’ which means that it takes rightness as its master and never diverts from dao. [Mencius says that] ‘This is generated by consistent moral actions,’ which means that everything one does is in accordance with rightness” (Yishu 1; 11).

To say that cultivation of vital force consists in consistent moral actions, however, for Cheng Hao, does not mean that one has to exert artificial effort to do what is right, even though one does not have the inclination to do it. For this reason, he repeatedly cites Mencius’ claim that “while you must never let it out of your mind, you must not forcibly help it grow either” (Mencius 2a2). In other words, one has to set one’s mind on moral actions and yet cannot force such actions upon oneself. What is important for Cheng Hao is that, when one engages oneself in moral practices, one is not to regulate one’s action with the principle of rightness, as otherwise one will not be able to feel joy in it. In Cheng Hao’s view, this is a distinction best exemplified by the sage king Shun, who “practices from rightness and humanity” instead of “practicing rightness and humanity” (Yishu 3; 61). In other words, one cannot regard morality as external rules that constrain one’s action but as internal source that inclines one to act naturally, without effort, and at ease.

A person becomes evil because of the turbid external force. However, the turbid force can also make one evil because a person’s will is not firm. Thus another way of moral cultivation is to firm up one’s will (chi zhi). While cultivation of the vital force can help firming up one’s original good will, firming up one’s original good will can also help cultivate the vital force. Thus, referring to Mencius’ view about the relationship between these two, Cheng Hao states that, “for a person whose vital force is yet to be cultivated, the activity of the vital force may move one’s will, and the decision of one’s will may cause the movement of the vital force. However, to a person whose virtue is fulfilled, since the will is already firmed up, the vital force will not be able to change one’s will” (Yishu 1; 11). So in Cheng Hao’s view, to avoid being polluted by turbid vital force, it is important to firm up one’s will: “as soon as one’s will is firmed up, the vital force cannot cause any trouble” (Yishu 2b; 53). On the one hand, if one’s will is not firm, it may be disturbed by violent vital force; on the other hand, if one’s will is firm, the vital force cannot disturb it.

In order to firm up one’s will, Cheng Hao claims that it is most important to live in reverence (ju jing). The primary function of being in reverence is to overcome one’s selfish desires: “As soon as one has selfish desires, [one’s heart-mind] will wither, and the flood-like vital force will be lacking” (Yishu 2a; 29). To be reverent inside is to overcome selfish desires. As soon as these selfish desires are overcome, one will be like a sage, who “is happy with things because they are things one ought to be happy with, and is angry at things because they are things one ought to be angry at. The sage’s being happy or angry is thus according to things and not according to his own likes or dislikes” (Wenji 2; 461). This is because, in Cheng Hao’s view, the inborn virtues of sages and worthies are also complete in everyone’s original nature. Thus when not harmed, one need only practice straightly from the inside. If there is some damage, one must be reverent so that it can be purified and return to its original state (Yishu 1; 1).

These two ways of moral cultivation – cultivation of the vital force (yang qi), which relies upon consistent moral actions (jiyi), and firming up one’s will (chi zhi), which relies upon one’s being reverent (ju jin) – are what the Book of Chang calls “being reverent (jing) so that one’s inner [heart-mind] will be upright and being right (yi) so that one’s external [actions] will be in accord [with principle].” The former is internal and the latter is external. In Cheng Hao’s view, they are also the only ways to become a sage. One of the common features of these two methods is that they both aim at one’s virtues so that a virtuous person takes delight in being virtuous without making forced efforts (Yishu 2a; 20). Thus, just as he emphasizes “being reverent so that the inner will be straightened” (jing yi zhi nei) instead of “using reverence to straighten the inner” (yi jing zhi nei), he emphasizes “being morally right so that one’s external action will be squared” (yi yi fang wai) instead of “using rightness to square one’s external action” (yi yi fang wai) (Yishu 11; 120). (Although these two Chinese phrases appear identical in romanization, they contain different characters, as can be seen from their different translations.) Moreover, while the two ways can be respectively called internal way and external way, Cheng Hao emphasizes that it is important “to combine the inner way and the external way” (Yishu 1; 9). In other words, these two ways are not separate, as if one could practice one without practicing the other.

6. Influence

Han Yu (768-824), an important Tang dynasty Confucian, established a lineage of the Confucian tradition (daotong) from Yao, Shun, Yu, Tang, King Wen, King Wu, Duke of Zhou, Confucius, and Mencius. He claimed that, after Mencius, this lineage was interrupted. Cheng Yi accepted this Confucian daotong and claimed that his brother Cheng Hao was the first one to continue this lineage after Mencius (Wenji 11; 640). While there may be some exaggeration in such a claim, particularly as it is in the tomb inscription he wrote for his own brother, there is also truth in it. According to one widely accepted chronology, there are three epochs of Confucianism: pre-Qin Classical Confucianism, neo-Confucianism in the Song and Ming dynasties, and contemporary Confucianism. In the second stage, as far as neo-Confucianism can be characterized as the learning of principle, Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi can indeed be regarded as its true founders, and their learning, through their numerous students, to a large extent determined the later development of neo-Confucianism. While the two brothers share fundamentally similar views and most of these students learned from both, different students noticed and exaggerated their different emphases and thus developed different schools. Among all their students, Xie Liangzuo (1050-1103) and Yang Shi (1053-1135) are the most distinguished. Yang Shi transmitted Cheng Yi’s teaching through his student Luo Congyan (1072-1135) and the latter’s student Li Tong (1093-1163), to Zhu Xi. The synthesizer of the lixue school of neo-Confucianism, Xie Liangzuo transmitted Cheng Hao’s learning through a few generations of students such as Wang Ping (1082-1153) and Zhang Jiucheng (1092-1159) to Lu Jiuyuan (1139-1193) and eventually to Wang Yangming, the culminating figure of the xinxue school of neo-Confucianism. Sometimes a third school of neo-Confucianism, xingxue (learning of human nature), is identified, whose most important representative is Hu Hong (?-1161). Hu Hong continued the learning of his father, Hu Anguo (1074-1138), who in turn was also influenced by Xie Liangzuo. In this sense, Cheng Hao leaves his mark on all three main schools of neo-Confucianism (all recognized, in Chinese scholarship, as lixue, learning of principle, understood in the broad sense).

7. References and Further Reading

  • Bol, Peter. Neo-Confucianism in History. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Asia Center, 2008.
    • There are scattered discussions of Cheng Hao throughout the book.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • Chapter 31 is the most extensive English translation of selected sayings and writings by Cheng Hao.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucianism, vol. 1. New Haven, Conn.: College and University Press, 1957.
    • Chapter 9 is devoted to Cheng Hao.
  • Cheng, Hao & Cheng, Yi. Collected Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng Ji). Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1988.
    • A collection of the works and sayings of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi.
  • Fung, Yu-lan (Feng, Yulan). A History of Chinese Philosophy. Vol. II. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • Chapter XII, Section 2, is a combined study of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi.
  • Graham, A.C. Two Chinese Philosophers. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1992.
    • The only book length study of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi in English.
  • Hon, Tze-ki. “Cheng Hao.” In A. S. Cua, ed., Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy. New York: Routledge, 2003.
    • A full length article on Cheng Hao’s philosophy.
  • Hsu, Fu-kuan. “Chu Hsi and Cheng Brothers.” In Wing-tsit Chan, ed., Chu Hsi and Neo-Confucianism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii, 1986.
    • A study of the similarity and difference between Zhu Xi and the Cheng brothers.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. Essentials of Neo-Confucianism: Eight Major Philosophers of the Song and Ming Periods. Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1999.
    • One chapter is devoted to a philosophical study of Cheng Hao.
  • Huang, Yong. “Confucian Love and Global Ethics: How the Cheng Brothers Would Help Respond to Christian Criticisms.” Asian Philosophy 15/1 (2005): 35-60.
    • A discussion of the contemporary significance of the Cheng brothers’ interpretation of love with distinction.
  • Huang, Yong. “The Cheng Brothers’ Onto-Theological Articulation of Confucian Values.” Asian Philosophy 17/3 (2007): 187-211.
    • An interpretation of the Cheng brothers’ li as life-giving activity.
  • Huang, Yong. “Neo-Confucian Political Philosophy: The Cheng Brothers on Li (Propriety) as Political, Psychological, and Metaphysical.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 34/2 (2007): 217-239.
    • An exposition of the Cheng brothers’ li as rules of action, as one’s inner feeling, and as human nature.
  • Huang, Yong. “Why Be Moral? The Cheng Brothers’ Neo-Confucian Answer.” Journal of Religious Ethics 36/2 (2008): 321-353.
    • A discussion of the Cheng brothers’ conception of human nature as a response to the question of why be moral.
  • Wong, Wai-ying. “The Status of li in the Cheng Brothers’ Philosophy.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 3/1 (2003): 109-119.
    • An important study of the Cheng brothers’ conception of propriety.
  • Wong, Wai-ying. “Morally Bad in the Philosophy of the Cheng Brothers.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 36/1 (2009): 157-176.
    • A good discussion of the Cheng brothers’ view of evil.

Author Information

Yong Huang
Kutztown University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

Liezi (Lieh-tzu, cn. 4th cn. B.C.E.)

The Liezi (Lieh-tzu), or Master Lie may be considered to be the third of the Chinese philosophical texts in the line of thought represented by the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, subsequently classified as Daojia (“the School of the Way”) or Daoist philosophy. Whether Master Lie existed as an actual person or not, the text bears his name in order to indicate its adherence to the line of thought and practice associated with this name. This appears to be true of other early texts, such as the Laozi, the Heguanzi, and the Guiguzi, for example. Despite the controversy over its dating and authorship, this is a philosophical treatise that clearly stands in the same tradition as the Zhuangzi, dealing with many of the same issues, and on occasion with almost identical passages. The Liezi continues the line of philosophical thinking of the Xiao Yao You, and the Qiu Shui, from which it takes up the themes of transcending boundaries, spirit journeying, cultivation of equanimity, and acceptance of the vicissitudes of life. It also continues the line of thought of the Yang Sheng Zhu, and the Da Sheng, developing the theme of cultivating extreme subtlety of perception and extraordinary levels of skill. It is noteworthy that the Liezi stands out as more apparently metaphysical than the cosmologically oriented texts of the Zhou and Han dynasties (such as the Laozi, Zhong Yong, and the Xici of the Yijing). That is, it goes further towards explicitly articulating a conception of the ‘transcendent’ or ‘metaphysical’: that which is beyond the realm of observable things that come into and go out of existence, and that is prior to, superior to, and responsible for it as its necessary condition. While the Liezi does not unambiguously articulate the logical conditions that define transcendence as such (a necessarily asymmetrical relation of dependence between the world and its source), still, the traces of transcendence are intriguing and worth philosophical investigation.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. The Liezi Text
  3. Central Concepts in the Liezi
    1. Chapter 1: Tian Rui (Omens of Nature)
    2. Chapter 2: Huang Di (The Yellow Emperor)
    3. Chapter 3: Zhou Mu Wang (King Mu of Zhou)
    4. Chapter 4: Zhong Ni (Confucius)
    5. Chapter 5: Tang Wen (The Questions of Tang)
    6. Chapter 6: Li Ming (Effort and Circumstance)
    7. Chapter 7: Yang Zhu (Yang Zhu)
    8. Chapter 8: Shuo Fu (Explaining the Signs)
  4. Key Interpreters of Liezi
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

The character after whom the text is named is called Lie Yukou; his personal name, “Yukou,” means ‘guard-against-bandits.’ According to the Liezi itself, he lived in the Butian game preserve in the principality of Zheng, but was eventually driven by famine to live in Wei. The first chapter of the Zhuangzi refers to Liezi, and so, if this character corresponds to a really existing person, he must have existed prior to the writing of that chapter. This means that Liezi would have flourished some time before the end of the fourth century BCE. W. T. Chan places him as early as the fifth century. He was said to have been a student of Huzi (Huqiu Zilin), and a fellow student of Bohun Wuren (wuren: “no person”), and teacher of Baifeng. However, it is not clear whether there ever really existed a philosopher named ‘Liezi.’ Liezi is not explicitly mentioned in any of the early classifications of philosophical schools: those of Xunzi, Zhuangzi’s Tianxia chapter, and Sima Qian. Moreover, the character is understood to be an adept with superhuman powers. Zhuangzi, for example, says that he had the ability to fly for fifteen days at a time. Yang Bojun insists that, despite the mythologizing of the character, there is sufficient scattered evidence that there probably did exist a real person on whom the stories were based. Nevertheless, scholars have for centuries been suspicious of the existence of Master Lie, and of the authenticity of the text.

The ideas expressed throughout the text have clear affinities with the philosophies expressed in the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, and so categorizing these three as belonging to roughly the same tradition of thought is not problematic—even if the authors, contributors, and commentators did not think of themselves as proponents of a single doctrine, or as belonging to the same ‘school’. The Laozi is sometimes quoted with approval, although the quotations are attributed either to the Book of the Yellow Emperor, or to Lao Dan. While the Liezi does not refer to the Zhuangzi, it shows clear signs of influence from the latter (even though the character Liezi is supposed to have lived before Zhuangzi). This indicates a later dating of much, if not all, of the text.

Unlike the Laozi, this text displays little interest in critiquing the Ruists or Confucians, and unlike the Zhuangzi, does not criticize the ‘Ru Mo’—the Ruists and Mohists. On the contrary, it shows signs of reconciliation of Ruist and Daoist ideas: many Ruist principles are given Daoist interpretation, and Confucius appears in several stories as a wise and sympathetic character, if not a sage. Incidentally, that one of the chapters of the text is named after Confucius should not, by itself, be taken as significant. The chapter is so named, solely because the name of Confucius appears at the beginning of the first story. This eclectic reconciliation of Ruism, Daoism, and on occasion Mohism, is indication of the post-Qin provenance of the relevant passages.

While Zhuangzi’s own philosophy is believed to have exerted a significant influence on the interpretation of Buddhism in China, the Liezi may constitute a possible converse case of Mahayana Buddhist influence on the development of the ideas of Zhuangzi. Stories here and there resonate with some of the tenets of Sanlun (the Chinese form of Madhyamaka), Weishilun (the Chinese form of Yogacara), and Huayan. The resonances are highly suggestive, but the evidence is not decisive enough to be sure of any influence, either of Buddhist ideas on the Liezi, or vice versa. If the conjecture of Buddhist influence is correct, it would also place the relevant passages of the text well into, if not after, the Han dynasty.

2. The Liezi Text

The text, like many other early Chinese ‘books,’ is a collection of various materials, written at different times, some of which can also be found in other sources. Liu Xiang, the Western Han scholar, says in his preface that he edited and collated material from twenty chapters distributed in other collections, and reduced them to eight by eliminating excess materials. The extant eight chapter version, with Zhang Zhan’s commentary, dates from the Western Jin (approximately three centuries later).

Each chapter contains a series of stories, each developing some theme whose antecedents can often be discerned from the Laozi or the Zhuangzi. Several themes are developed in each chapter, and some chapters overlap in themes, but as with the Zhuangzi, each chapter has its distinctive ‘feel’. About one quarter of the text consists of passages that can be found in other early works, such as the Zhuangzi, the Huainanzi, and the Lüshi Chunqiu. The remaining majority of the text, however, is distinctive in style, and with the exception of the “Yang Zhu” chapter quite consistent in the world view and way of life that it expresses. Most of the text contains material of philosophical interest. However, myths and folk tales based on similar themes, but with no apparent philosophical value, can be found side by side with stories that have profound philosophical significance.

The “Yang Zhu” chapter is problematic. While the earliest reference to the text (Liu Xiang) lists a chapter with the title, the currently extant version of this chapter has little to nothing in common with the rest of the book, and indeed espouses a hedonist philosophy of pleasure seeking that is inconsistent with the cultivation of indifference toward worldly things that is characteristic of much of the rest of the book, and of the Zhuang-Lie approach to Daoism in general.

The “authenticity” of the Liezi text has been challenged by Chinese scholars for centuries, and it has accordingly been taken by perhaps a majority of scholars to be a forgery. Their claim is that the textual material was compiled, edited, and written by a single author who intended to deceive readers into believing that this was an ancient text. Certainly, the text is an eclectic compilation consisting of early materials which can be found in other texts, together with original material dating from well after the time period from which its supposed author is said to have lived. However, as Zhuang Wanshou points out, the characteristics cited for classifying the text as a forgery—being composed by several authors over several centuries, and drawing from several sources—apply to other philosophical texts which are not dismissed as “forgeries,” including, for example, the Analects and the Zhuangzi. Moreover, it is not clear why this should be considered sufficient reason to reject, and neglect, the Liezi as a philosophical text. Moreover, from a purely philosophical point of view, whoever wrote the text, and whenever it was written, it contains much material that expresses distinctively recognizable strands of Lao-Zhuang thought, with sufficient complexity and sophistication to warrant serious study as the third of the important Daoist philosophical texts.

3. Central Concepts in the Liezi

a. Chapter 1: Tian Rui (Omens of Nature)

In the opening chapter of the Liezi we can identify the beginnings of an articulation of a concept of a ‘beyond’ (wai) that bears a striking resemblance to Western concepts of the “transcendent” or “metaphysical.” I mean these terms more or less synonymously, and in the strong philosophical sense of: that which lies beyond the realm of experience, and stands independently as its necessary condition. The idea of a ‘beyond’ occurs several times, in different formulations, but it is unclear how close this gets to the Western concept of a metaphysical transcendent. In particular, while the formulations suggest an asymmetric relation of dependence—namely, that a realm beyond the conditions of existing things is itself a necessary condition for the existing, changing, things that we encounter, and not vice versa—it does not clearly and explicitly assert it as a necessarily asymmetrical relation. Still, this chapter goes much further than the Laozi or the Zhuangzi toward articulating anything like this sort of transcendence, and so if we are going to claim to find anything like it in the Daoist tradition, our best bet is with the Liezi.

The chapter begins with an account of something that is the condition of the existence of living and changing things. At first glance, this appears to define a metaphysical beyond that can only be hinted at negatively: that which is beyond birth and transformation (the unborn/not-living, busheng, and the unchanging, buhua), and which is responsible for all birth and transformation. It is the unborn that is able to produce the living, and the unchanging that is able to change the changing. This strongly suggests a dependence of the living on the unborn, of the changing on the unchanging. However, while the text explicitly asserts that the unborn/not-living can produce the living, it does not explicitly deny the opposite. Without this explicit assertion of necessary asymmetry, it has not, strictly speaking, claimed a transcendent role for the unborn/unchanging. Thus, the passage can still be read as entirely consistent with the typical Daoist claim that the stages of living and not living, and of change and not changing, are interdependent contrasts, each giving rise to the other.

The chapter also contains an explicit cosmology (a philosophical account of the basic makeup of the world), and, asks about the beginnings of heaven and earth. The text postulates several great beginnings, (taiyi, taichu, taishi, taisu), which successively mark an undifferentiated stage, a stage of energy (qi), a stage of embodied form (xing), and a stage of intrinsic stuff (zhi). The energies (or perhaps forms, or stuff, the text is not explicit) divide into two kinds: the light becomes the ‘heavens’ (tian), the heavy becomes the earth, and the blending of the two becomes the human realm. Here again, with questions about ‘great origins,’ we sense a possible concern with transcendence, but everything that is explicitly stated is compatible with an organic, naturalistic cosmology, and does not require the imposition of the full-blooded concept of metaphysical transcendence.

There follows an intriguing passage in which it is stated that that which produces, shapes, and colors, has not yet tasted, existed, or appeared. Here, an attempt is made to articulate a distinction between a realm of form that has perceptible properties, and a realm prior to form, shape, smell, etc which is responsible for these, and which itself does not have these perceptible properties. This passage is significant, because in this case, an asymmetry is for the first time explicitly articulated. However, the asymmetry is not asserted as a necessity, but merely as a contingent fact, thus still leaving room for interpreting the producer and the produced as interdependent.

After considering the cosmic beginnings, the chapter ends with a discussion of the possible end of the world. If the heavens (and the earth) are accumulated qi, then why might they not eventually come apart? Several answers are considered: they couldn’t come apart, because they are qi of a specific kind. Or: they could come apart, but that is so far off it is not something we need worry about. Or: It is beyond our knowledge whether they could ever come apart. Finally, Liezi’s answer is that both alternatives are “nonsense”: to say that tiandi will perish is nonsense, and to say that it won’t is nonsense. While the logic of this answer is left incomplete, it reminds us of the logic of the Sanlun philosophy of Madhyamaka Buddhism. The Sanlun philosophy tries to articulate a rejection of simplistic dichotomies, and encourages a third way (a ‘middle path’) that involves transcending the perspective from which we must choose between such dichotomies. There are other places in the Liezi where these hints of Sanlun emerge more explicitly, suggesting the possibility of Buddhist influence, and thereby a later dating of the text (or at least of these passages). It is worth noting, however, that the anti-metaphysical stance of Madhyamaka Buddhism is inconsistent with the positing of a realm of transcendence—thereby complicating the issue still further.

b. Chapter 2: Huang Di (The Yellow Emperor)

The Daoists are known for extolling the marvellous abilities of people with extraordinary skills, and the Liezi is no exception. Stories abound of people who perform breathtaking, sometimes life-threatening, feats with tranquil ease and flawless artistry. While these people are not directly called sages, they are nevertheless looked up to as exemplary of the ideals of the Daoist way of life.

What they have is extraordinary ability, but it is not to be understood mere daring or bravery; nor is it to be understood as qiao, skill, dexterity, or craftsmanship, in the ordinary sense of those terms. It is not simply a matter of technique, but rather of inner cultivation. These abilities arise when one understands and follows the natures or tendencies of things, and it is an understanding that cannot be put into words. As such, it is not something that one consciously knows: one might say, using the language of Polanyi, that it is a form of “tacit knowing.” Liezi emphasizes the point with examples of unwitting sages, people who naturally have a potent ability, and yet have no idea of how extraordinary they are, and indeed whose ignorance is in some cases the necessary condition of their exceptional abilities.

In other cases, or for other people, years of fasting, training, and discipline are necessary to cultivate such abilities. To engage successfully with things requires penetrating through to the inner tendencies of things, to that which lies at the root of things, beyond their observable shape and form. The sage unifies his nature (xing), energies, and potency, with a single-minded concentration on the task at hand, aware of nothing except the circumstances and the goal, and is subtly in tune with the innermost core of things. When one is able, in this way, to penetrate to the place where things are ‘forged’, one is no longer at their mercy, and then the extremes of life’s circumstances cannot ‘enter’ (ru) to disturb one’s tranquility.

c. Chapter 3: Zhou Mu Wang (King Mu of Zhou)

What is waking experience, or dream experience? What is the relation between them? From a realist perspective, only waking experience is experience of reality, while dream experience is an ‘imaginary’ reproduction of the experiences without there being a corresponding dream reality. From an idealist perspective, the difference is less radical. It is, to a large extent, a difference in degree, rather than in kind. Waking experience is simply more coherent and more enduring, and is shared by others. What, then, if there were a kind of dream experience that was more coherent and more enduring? How would we draw the distinction then? What if there a kind of dream experience that could be shared with others? Would this not constitute a radical challenge to the distinction between waking and dreaming?

It is notable that the term huan is used to talk of the status of dreams, and thereby also of our waking experience to the extent that it too is considered to be dreamlike. The term means ‘illusion’, and suggests a very strong devaluation of what we ordinarily take to be genuine experience. In some sense, all experience is for us a magnificent, magical display, a phantasmagoria of sensory delights and horrors. Seen in this light, dream and waking experience become equalized: the reality of dreams is of the same order as the illusory nature of waking experience. From an idealist perspective of this sort, waking experience is ultimately no different from a dream. This is reminiscent of the Vedanta conception of maya, and indeed it is noteworthy that huan is the word standardly used to translate the Buddhist concept of maya. If it is the case, as most scholars argue, that there is no evidence of an indigenous Chinese tradition developing a distinction between the realms of ‘Appearance’ and ‘Reality’, then this would seem to indicate the possibility of Indian influence, most probably via the Yogacara incorporation of Vedanta philosophical concepts, imparted through its Chinese form of Weishilun.

d. Chapter 4: Zhong Ni (Confucius)

In the opening of this chapter, Confucius is found lamenting his lack of success in life, and his beloved disciple Yan Hui reminds him to cultivate indifference. Confucius responds in a manner that attempts to provide a reconciliation of Daoist virtue and cultivation with Ruist social involvement. Thus, coming to terms with tian and ming means more than simply accepting everything that happens to us with equanimity or indifference. Equanimity means rejoicing in nothing, but to rejoice in nothing requires rejoicing equally in everything. And to rejoice equally in everything requires being fully immersed in each and every one of our concerns, in our successes and failures. Thus, it is entirely appropriate, and consistent with Liezi’s form of Daoism, for Confucius to grieve that he did not succeed, during his lifetime, in transforming the state. This is a very clever reinterpretation of the Daoist cultivation of equanimity that makes it compatible with care and concern for social ventures. It takes Daoist logic that leads us away from worldliness, and follows it through so that it leads us right back into the thick of things. In doing so, it anticipates the Chan (Zen) response to Huayan Buddhism.

The intuitive ‘non-knowing’ of the Huang Di chapter is then applied to the subject of governing in order to describe a Daoist kind of ‘mystical’ rulership. One rules most skilfully by doing ‘nothing.’ The ruler cultivates an intuitive sensitivity to the natures of people and circumstances, and becomes so sensitive to all that happens that he or she can respond appropriately, without necessarily knowing, or consciously planning, or taking deliberate control, or making crude judgments regarding what is right and what is wrong.

e. Chapter 5: Tang Wen (The Questions of Tang)

This chapter opens up another kind of metaphysical problem: the problem of what things are like ‘outside’ of the realms of familiarity, and gives expression to a sense of the magnificence of the world: vast, unencompassable dimensions, and the extraordinary variety of things, creatures, cultures, and places. The problem is posed, and different answers are suggested, but I think it would be a mistake to try to find a consistent metaphysical position asserted as the correct one. Rather, the text engages in a literary-philosophical exploration of some possibilities. Also, several implications are explored, drawing together concepts from other chapters: sameness and difference, the vast and the petty, the infinite and inexhaustible, the skill of the imperceptible.

As we move from region to region throughout its boundless extent, we meet up with increasingly strange varieties of things. Yet despite their differences, are they after all just variations on a theme? All things are different, and yet is it not also the case that all things are in a deeper sense the same? In either case, to one who is truly at home in the universe, the extraordinary and wonderful varieties are remarkable but not to be considered weird. Thus, unlike our typical tendency to marvel at the peculiar weirdness of the ‘exotic,’ this chapter encourages us to de-exoticize the unfamiliar.

Going beyond the limits is conceived not simply as moving outwards along a trajectory, but as occuring between levels of containment. To go outside, or beyond, is to move to a higher level within which the previous level is contained. But this very movement immediately suggests the possibility of iteration, and thus leads to the Daoist formulation of a problem concerning finitude. Are there ultimate limits of containment to how far we can go beyond? If so, is there such a thing as what is beyond those limits? Or is the process limitless? If so, can there be such a thing as what is beyond the limitless?

Conversely, the ‘inexhaustible’ refers to movement in the opposite direction, inwardly from the vast to the minuscule. At its extreme, the inexhaustible, infinitesimal within things, approaches nothing. The more subtle and minuscule it gets, the more it escapes the purview of ordinary sensory awareness. It is the inexhaustible subtleties within things that enable things to be what they are, and so sensitivity to such subtleties can and should be cultivated. Since such an awareness is unavailable to ordinary perception, and since as we have seen in Chapter 2 it is also non-verbal, it is thought of as a kind of intuitive embodied insight that remains beneath the level of conscious awareness. When we cultivate this, we are able to sense the innermost tendencies of things, respond to changes before they manifest, and thus act without interfering. The sagely charioteer, for example, does not force the horses to move, nor fight the terrain, but has a subtle sensitivity to the terrain, and to the every movement of the horses, and is able to guide, even to “control”, merely by following intuitively, tacitly, the tendencies of things.

This distinction between the vast and the petty also has more familiar, less mystical application. Great things can be achieved by focusing on the here and now: no need for a long term plan, for far reaching vision. Just keep doing what you can, no matter how dense and shortsighted: the results will take care of themselves. Great things can thus be achieved unwittingly, stupidly even. Hence, the stupid man is able to move the mountain.

f. Chapter 6: Li Ming (Effort and Circumstance)

The chapter raises the question: to what must we attribute the vicissitudes of life, our successes and failures? Is it really something that is in our control, that can be changed by li, human effort? Or is it, after all, just circumstance, ming, in this case not inappropriately interpreted as ‘fate’? That is, is it something our efforts can affect, or is it something we can do nothing about?

In the Zhuangzi, an answer is given that is reminiscent of Stoicism: that the circumstances into which we emerge are simply the way things are. We must learn to accept our lot, ming, with equanimity. There appear to be two answers given in the Liezi, one of which, given at the end of the chapter, echoes this answer of Zhuangzi. But at the beginning of the chapter, the two alternatives of li and ming are rejected. Instead, the answer is given that we must learn to accept that whatever happens, it is just the way things are, Gu. In fact, these two answers are not different, since the sense being expressed by gu in the Liezi is precisely what is expressed by the word ming in the Zhuangzi. The answer to this problem lies in the fact that the word ming has two senses. In the Zhuangzi and other early texts, ming is the circumstances that surround us, the way things are. It also has aspects of the following senses: life, lifespan, lot (in life), calling, naming, command, circumstance, that into which we are thrown, and with which we must come to terms. Insofar as this does not necessarily imply an external determining force, it differs from the concept of ‘fate.’

But it also may be used in a less sophisticated sense to refer to an external force which is in control of things, that is “fate” or “destiny”. This sense of the word can be found as early as the Mozi, in the Fei Ming (Against Fate) chapter. When the Liezi contrasts li and ming, it is in this cruder sense that ming is being rejected. Instead, the word gu is used in this text as a synonym for what was expressed by ming in the Zhuangzi. What is being denied, then, in these passages is that neither effort, nor any external force of destiny is truly in control of what happens. Thus, it is the dichotomy of personal control vs external control that is being rejected: it is not that success or failure is determined by us, nor is it the case that success or failure is determined by external circumstances. Nor, incidentally, is the point that there is always a combination of both effort and circumstance. Rather, whatever effort is involved, and whatever the circumstances, in all cases it is always a matter of how things just happened to turn out. In the end, even if neither effort nor circumstance determine the outcome, yet the outcome has simply followed its gu, the way it is.

g. Chapter 7: Yang Zhu (Yang Zhu)

The ideas of this chapter are so inconsistent with the rest of the text that it is clearly out of place. Exactly how and why it made its way into this collection, and succeeded in remaining there, is unclear. It espouses a hedonistic philosophy: Life is short; Live for pleasure alone; Don’t waste time cultivating virtues. If it bears any relation to Daoist philosophy, then it appears to be a sophomoric misunderstanding of the ideas of the Xiao Yao You chapter of the Zhuangzi. Graham suggests that it comes from a former Yangist phase of the author’s philosophical career, and that it was written, in part, to provide a foil against which to understand his later philosophy.

h. Chapter 8: Shuo Fu (Explaining the Signs)

This chapter is a mixed collection of stories, exploring themes of varying philosophical significance. A recurring theme expresses a particularist attitude that might be thought of as a kind of casuistry (according to which judgments are made by comparing the particularities of individual cases), or contextualism (according to which judgments ought to be made only when all differences of context are factored in). Several stories are told, in each of which we have apparently similar circumstances in which the outcome varies significantly. The point is to emphasize that we cannot simply assume that what appear to be similar situations require similar responses from us. We must treat each case in the light of its own unique circumstances. That is, instead of looking for simple rules to be applied at all times, we must instead learn how to read the subtleties of the ‘signs’. This may be done either through a clear and explicit awareness that arises from careful observation, or through an intuitive and embodied understanding that arises from familiarity and practice.

4. Key Interpreters of Liezi

The first eight chapter edition of the text may have been edited and compiled by Liu Xiang (77—6BCE). If this edition ever existed, it is no longer extant. Zhang Zhan’s annotated edition (around 370 CE) became popular from the Tang dynasty, and this edition with Zhang’s commentary has become the received version. A second philosophical commentary was produced by Lu Chongxuan in the 8th century). After the Tang, doubts began to be raised about its authenticity, beginning with Liu Zongyuan (773—819). Unfortunately, most of the scholarly discussion around this text has concerned its dating and “authenticity,” and consequently, there has been little to no serious interpretation of the text regarding its philosophical content.

The concern to dismiss the text increased in the early twentieth century. In 1919, Ma Shulun argued that it was a forgery made by students of Wang Bi, stealing materials from many prior philosophical sources. In 1920, Takeuchi Yoshio published a refutation of Ma Shulun, but acknowledged that the text was a late compilation. In 1949, Cen Zhongmian, attempted to defend the text, using modern techniques of linguistic analysis to argue that it dated from the late Zhou, but his argument has not been influential. In 1927, Liang Qichao even suggested that it was in fact the commentator Zhang Zhan himself who forged the book.

In 1979, two excellent editions of the Liezi with important critical commentaries were published: one by Yang Bojun in Beijing, the other by Zhuang Wanshou in Taibei. It is important to note that Zhuang’s so-called Du Ben not merely a study book, but is a significant work in its own right.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Barrett, T. H. “Lieh Tzu.” In Early Chinese Texts: A Bibliographical Guide, ed. Michael Loewe (Berkeley: Society for the Study of Early China and the Institute of East Asian Studies, University of California, Berkeley, 1993), 298-308.
  • Graham, A. C. The Book of Lieh-tzu. New York: Columbia University Press, 1960.
  • Graham, A. C. “The Date and Composition of the Lieh-Tzu.” In Studies in Chinese Philosophy and Philosophical Literature (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990), 216-282.
  • Yang, Bojun. Liezi Jishi. Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1979.
  • Wieger, Leo. Taoism: The Philosophy of China. Burbank, CA: Ohara Publications, 1976.
  • Zhuang, Wanshou. Xinyi Liezi Duben. Taibei: Sanmin Shuju, 1979.

Author Information

Steve Coutinho
Muhlenberg College
U. S. A.

Mozi (Mo-tzu, c. 400s—300s B.C.E.)

moziMo Di (Mo Ti), better known as Mozi (Mo-tzu) or "Master Mo," was a Chinese thinker active from the late 5th to the early 4th centuries B.C.E. He is best remembered for being the first major intellectual rival to Confucius and his followers. Mozi's teaching is summed up in ten theses extensively argued for in the text that bears his name, although he himself is unlikely to have been its author. The most famous of these theses is the injunction that one ought to be concerned for the welfare of people in a spirit of "impartial concern" (jian'ai) that does not make distinctions between self and other, associates and strangers, a doctrine often described more simplistically as "universal love." Mozi founded a quasi-religious and paramilitary community that, apart from propagating the ten theses, lent aid to small states under threat from military aggressors with their expertise in counter-siege technology. Along with the Confucians, the Mohists were one of the two most prominent schools of thought during the Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.), although contemporary sources such as the Hanfeizi and the Zhuangzi indicate that the Mohists had divided into rival sects by this time. While Mohist communities probably did not survive into the Qin dynasty (221-206 B.C.E.), Mohist ideas exerted a decisive influence upon the thinkers of early China. Between the late 4th and late 3rd centuries B.C.E., later Mohists wrote the earliest extant Chinese treatise on logic, as well as works on geometry, optics and mechanics. Mohist logic appears to have influenced the argumentative techniques of early Chinese thinkers, while Mohist visions of meritocracy and the public good helped to shape the political philosophies and policy decisions of both the Qin and Han (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.) imperial regimes. In these ways, Mohist ideas survived well into the early imperial era, albeit by being absorbed into other Chinese philosophical traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. The Core Chapters of the Mozi
  3. The Ten Core Theses of Mohism
  4. The Aims and Character of Mohist Doctrine
  5. Moral Epistemology
  6. The Foundations of Mohist Morality
  7. Impartial Concern
  8. Moral Psychology and Human Nature
  9. Government
  10. Frugality
  11. Just War
  12. Heaven and Spirits
  13. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

The details of Mozi's life are uncertain.  Early sources identify him variously as a contemporary of Confucius or as living after Confucius' time.  Modern scholars generally believe that Mozi was active from the late 5th to the early 4th centuries B.C.E., before the time of the Confucian philosopher Mencius, which places him in the early Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.) of ancient Chinese history.  Little can be known of his personal life.  Some early sources say that he, like Confucius, was a native of the state of Lu (in modern Shandong) and at one point served as a minister in the state of Song (in modern Henan). According to tradition, he studied with Confucian teachers but later rebelled against their ideas.  As was the case with Confucius, Mozi probably traveled among the various contending states to present his ideas before their rulers in the hope of obtaining political employment, with an equal lack of success.

Mozi founded a highly organized quasi-religious and military community, with considerable geographical reach.  Overseen by a "Grand Master" (juzi), members of the community -- "Mohists" (mozhe) -- were characterized by their commitment to ten theses ascribed to "Our Teacher Master Mo" (zimozi), versions of which are articulated in the "Core Chapters" of the eponymous text.  Quite apart from propagating the teachings of Mozi, the Mohist community also functioned as an international rescue organization that dispatched members versed in the arts of defensive military techniques to the aid of small states under threat from military aggressors. This outreach presumably stemmed from the Mohists' opposition to all forms of military aggression.

Some scholars speculate that Mozi and the Mohists probably came from a lower social class than, for instance, the Confucians, but the evidence is inconclusive and at best suggestive. Nevertheless, if the conjecture is true, it could well explain the often repetitive and artless style in which much of the Mozi is composed and the anti-aristocratic stance of much Mohist doctrine, as well as why the Mohists paid such attention to the basic economic livelihood of the common people.

2. The Core Chapters of the Mozi

The text known as the Mozi traditionally is divided into seventy-one "chapters," some of which are marked "missing" in the received text. Most scholars believe that the Mozi was probably not written by Master Mo himself, but by successive groups of disciples and their followers. No part of the text actually claims to be written by Mozi, although many parts purport to record his doctrines and conversations.

While there remain intense and complicated scholarly disputes over the exact dating and provenance of different parts of the Mohist corpus, it is probable that chapters 8-37 (the so-called "core chapters") derive either from the teachings of Mozi himself or from the formative period of the Mohist community and contain doctrines that were nominally adhered to by its members throughout much of the community's existence. The core chapters are replete with the formula "the doctrine of Our Teacher Master Mo says" (zimozi yan yue), prefixed to sayings presented as records of Master Mo's teaching.  (However, since the text most likely was not written by Mozi himself, this entry will refer to the doctrine presented in the core chapters in terms of "the Mohists" and "Mohist doctrine" rather than "Mozi" and "Mozi's doctrine.")

The core chapters consist of ten triads of essays, with seven chapters marked "missing." Each triad of chapters correlates with one of the ten Mohist theses.  Traditionally, these triads correspond to the "upper" (shang), "middle" (zhong) and "lower" (xia) versions of the thesis in question; in Western scholarship, they are usually referred to as versions "A," "B," and "C" of the corresponding thesis.  Intriguingly, the chapters that make up each triad often are very close to each other in wording without being exactly identical, thus raising questions about the precise relationship between them and with how the text assumed its present shape. One influential theory in recent times is Angus C. Graham's proposal that the triads correspond to oral traditions of Mohist doctrine transmitted by the three Mohist sects mentioned in the Hanfeizi, a third century B.C.E. philosophical text associated with a student of the Confucian thinker Xunzi.

Much of the core chapters is written in a style that is not calculated to please.  As Burton Watson puts it, the style is "marked by a singular monotony of sentence pattern, and a lack of wit or grace that is atypical of Chinese literature in general."  But Watson also concedes that the Mohists' arguments "are almost always presented in an orderly and lucid, if not logically convincing fashion." Whether or not the arguments of the core chapters are logically convincing can only be determined on a case-by-case basis, but it is at least possible that the artless style is the consequence of a deliberate choice to prioritize clarity of argumentation.

3. The Ten Core Theses of Mohism

The contents of the ten triads and thus the outlines of the ten core theses are briefly described below:

Chapters 8-10, "Elevating the Worthy" (shangxian), argue that the policy of elevating worthy and capable people to office in government whatever their social origin is a fundamental principle of good governance.  The proper implementation of such a policy requires that the rulers attract the talented to service by the conferring of honor, the reward of wealth and the delegation of responsibility (and thus power). On the other hand, the rulers' practice of appointing kinsmen and favorites to office without regard to their abilities is condemned.

Chapters 11-13, "Exalting Unity" (shangtong), contain a state-of-nature argument on the basis of which it is concluded that a unified conception of what is morally right (yi) consistently enforced by a hierarchy of rulers and leaders is a necessary condition for social and political order. The thesis applies to the world community as a whole, conceived as a single moral-political hierarchy with the common people at the bottom, the feudal princes in the middle, and the emperor at the summit, above whom is Heaven itself.

Chapters 14-16, "Impartial Concern" (jian'ai), argue that the cause of the world's troubles lies in people's tendency to act out of a greater regard for their own welfare than that of others, and that of associates over that of strangers, with the consequence that they often have no qualms about benefiting themselves or their own associates at the expense of others. The conclusion is that people ought to be concerned for the welfare of others without making distinctions between self, associates and strangers.

Chapters 17-19, "Against Military Aggression" (feigong), condemn military aggression as both unprofitable (even for the aggressors) and immoral. Version C introduces a distinction between justified and unjustified warfare, claiming that the former was waged by the righteous ancient sage rulers to overthrow evil tyrants.

Chapters 20-21 (22 is listed as "missing"), "Frugality in Expenditures" (jieyong), argue that good governance requires thrift in the ruler's expenditures. Useless luxuries are condemned. The chapters also argue for the clear priority of functionality over form in the making of various human artifacts (clothing, buildings, armor and weapons, boats and other vehicles).

Chapter 25 (23-24 are listed as "missing"), "Frugality in Funerals" (jiezang), has the same theme as "Frugality in Expenditures," but applies it to the specific case of funeral rituals. The aristocratic practices of elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning are condemned as "not morally right" (buyi) because they are not only useless to solving the world's problems, but add to the people's burdens.  Here, the Mohists target practices beloved by their Confucian contemporaries, for whom the maintenance of harmonious moral order in society is best accomplished through strict fidelity to ritual codes.

Chapters 26-28, "Heaven's Will" (Tianzhi), argue that the will of Heaven (Tian) -- portrayed as if it is a personal deity and providential agent who rewards the good and punishes the wicked -- is the criterion of what is morally right.  Here again, the Mohists contrast themselves with the Confucians, who regard Heaven as a moral but mysterious force that does not intervene directly in human affairs.

Chapter 31 (29-30 are listed as "missing"), "Elucidating the Spirits" (minggui), claims that a loss of belief in the existence, power and providential character of spirits -- supernatural agents of Tian tasked with enforcing its sanctions -- has led to widespread immorality and social and political chaos. The chapter consists of an exchange with certain skeptics, whom Mozi answers with arguments purporting to prove that providential spirits exist, but also that widespread belief in their existence brings great social and political benefit.

Chapter 32 (33-34 are listed as "missing"), "Against Music" (feiyue), condemns the musical displays of the aristocracy as immoralon the same basis according to which elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning are condemned in "Frugality in Funerals."  Just as in that chapter, here again the Mohists attack practices that are particularly dear to their Confucian rivals, who believe that music, if properly performed according to ancient canons, can play a vital role in the regulation of moral order and the cultivation of virtue.

Chapters 35-37, "Against Fatalism" (feiming), argue against the doctrine of fatalism (the thesis that human wisdom and effort have no effect on the outcomes of human endeavor) as pernicious and harmful in that widespread belief in it will lead to indolence and chaos. The chapters also contain crucial discussions on the general conditions or criteria (traditionally called the "Three Tests of Doctrine") that must be met by any doctrine if it is to be considered sound. (See Section 5: "Moral Epistemology" below.)

4. The Aims and Character of Mohist Doctrine

As in the case of many other philosophical conceptions in early China, Mohist doctrine is deeply rooted in the thinkers' response to the social and political problems that are perceived to beset the world (tianxia, "all beneath Heaven").  In particular, the Mohists are concerned to offer a practical solution to the chaos (luan) of the world so as to restore it to good order (zhi). A way to characterize the Mohists' concern is to say that they (like many early Chinese philosophers) seek and to put the Way (dao, the right way to live and to conduct the community's affairs) into practice rather than merely to discover and state the Truth about the universe. But there are also several more distinctively Mohist twists to this underlying concern.

First, the Mohists tend to equate the Way with a conception of what is morally right (yi or renyi ). For them, good order obtains when "right rules" (yizheng) rather than "might rules" (lizheng) in the world, and "right rules" when agents (both individual and groups) conduct themselves in a manner that is morally right. A way by which we might make sense of the Mohists' project is to see it as concerned with promoting the public good, where the public good is defined in terms of social and political justice.

Second, Mohist doctrine is almost exclusively concerned with moral behavior rather than moral character  although, to be more precise, the main object of moral evaluation in Mohist doctrine is usually a way of conduct (for the individual) or a policy (for the state), rather than individual acts. In line with this focus on behavior, concepts that are naturally understood to be virtues or desirable qualities of agents (e.g., benevolence and filial piety) in Confucian texts often are discussed as if they are reducible to the moral rightness of conduct. In "Frugality in Funerals," for instance, "the business of the filial son" is defined in terms of conduct that benefits the world, which is in turn, a criterion of moral rightness (see the next section).

Third, the Mohists see the morally right as conceptually distinct from the customary or traditional. An argument that appeals to the distinction can be found in "Frugality in Funerals."  The Mohists point to the variety between burial customs among the tribal peoples on the periphery of the Chinese world and note that, although what the tribes practice is customary within their communities, these practices also are all understood by an elite Chinese audience to be barbaric and immoral.  The Mohists thus urge that, just because elaborate funerals and lengthy mourning are customary practices among the gentlemen of the central states, this fact alone will not secure their consistency with moral rightness.

Fourth, for the Mohists, the Way is the subject of explicit expression in the form of "doctrine" (yan).  Before proceeding with this point, it must be stressed that the term yan in the core chapters and other texts contemporary to the period ( the Mencius for instance) is often not best taken as "language" or "speech" in any generic sense. Rather, it often means "doctrine" or "maxim of conduct," a verbal package meant to guide individual conduct and state policy. In other words, we can take yan in the core chapters as the verbal counterpart to a conception of the Way, a linguistic formula that identifies a Way of life and guiding the conduct of those who hold to it.

Not only are Mozi and the Mohists concerned to advance a Way, they are explicit in verbalizing their Way as doctrine, offering arguments for it and defending it against rival doctrines. In disputation, they often first formulate their rivals' positions as opposing doctrines before attempting to refute them.  They also often identify rivals by the doctrines they supposedly "hold to" (for instance, they speak of "the doctrine of those who hold to [the thesis that] ("fate exists'" in "Against Fatalism").  There is even a tendency to see the problematic conduct of people as largely springing from wrong doctrine, quite apart from the concern to offer arguments against various opponent positions. In addition, when the Mohists evaluate a practice or way of conduct, they sometimes speak in terms of evaluating the doctrinethat (putatively) corresponds to that practice (see, for instance, "Frugality in Funerals").

The "Ten Theses" as a whole can thus be taken as presenting the sum of Mohist doctrine, which is itself the verbal or linguistic counterpart to their Way, their conception of what is morally right. The characteristically Mohist tendency to see the Way as open to linguistic formulation puts them in sharp contrast with "Daoist" traditions such as those associated with Laozi and Zhuangzi. In fact, as Robert Eno has argued, the Mohist focus on doctrine very likely forms the polemical background to the critique against language in texts such as the "Discourse on Making Things Equal" chapter in the Zhuangzi.

5. Moral Epistemology

One of the philosophically most interesting aspects of the Mohist concern with doctrine is their explicit discussion of criteria for evaluating doctrine in the "Against Fatalism" chapters.  The "Three Tests of Doctrine" are introduced as the "standards" or "gnomons" (yi) without which doctrinal disputes become futile. As version C puts it: "To expound doctrine without first establishing standards (yi) is like telling time using a sundial that has been placed on a spinning potter's wheel."  The consequence is that the dispute will be interminable.

Although each version of "Against Fatalism" lists three "Tests," the lists differ and a total of four distinct "Tests" can be identified:

  1. Conformity to the Will of Heaven and the Spirits -- this criterion is mentioned only in "Against Fatalism" B but forms the subject matter of the "Heaven's Will" chapters. In those chapters, we can also find the claim that Heaven's will is to Mozi like as "the compass is to a wheelwright or the setsquare is to a carpenter."  Just as the wheelwright and carpenter use these tools to evaluate if some object is properly considered round or square, so Mozi is said to lay down Heaven's will as a model (fa) and establish it as a standard (yi) by which conduct and doctrines can be evaluated.
  2. Conformity to the teaching and practice of the ancient sage kings -- Varieties of this "Test" are reported in all versions of "Against Fatalism" and its application can be seen throughout the core chapters.
  3. Good consequences for the welfare of the world (especially the material wellbeing of the common people understood in terms of them having food, shelter and rest) --  Varieties of this "Test" are also reported in all versions of "Against Fatalism" and a lengthy elaboration can also be found in "Frugality in Funerals."
  4. Confirmation by the testimony of the masses' sense of sight and hearing -- This "Test" is listed in "Against Fatalism" A and C, and there are only two certain applications" in the core chapters: in the "Elucidating Ghosts" chapter as part of the proof that providential ghosts exist, and in "Against Fatalism" B as part of the argument against the doctrine of fatalism.

There seems to be a widespread temptation to construe the different "Tests" in the following way: if a doctrine (yan) passes a "Test," it is true. On this interpretation, the third "Test" might suggest a pragmatic conception of truth (or at least a pragmatic conception of the justification of truth claims).  But such a reading is at best underdetermined by the text. It is also unnecessary as long as we keep in mind that the sort of yan at stake in the Core Chapters is usually such doctrine as is meant to guide conduct.

With that background in mind, we can at least see the first three "Tests" as being meant precisely for evaluating such yan as are naturally evaluated in terms of whether they correctly guide human conduct, rather than whether they make a true factual claim.  This means that these "Tests" are best taken as criteria for assessing the soundness of normative rather than descriptive claims.  Now given that Mohist doctrine is meant to be the verbal correlate of their conception of the Way, which in turn can be taken as their conception of what is morally right, it follows that "sound doctrine" in the context of Mohist thought is ultimately doctrine that enjoins morally right conduct and in this specific sense correctly guides human conduct. This also implies that each of these "Tests" can be understood as a criterion for moral rightness.

As for the fourth "Test," while it seems natural to take it as a criterion for evaluating factual, rather than normative claims, it should still be kept in mind that the Mohists appear to be primarily interested in the normative or policy implications of the (putatively factual) claims involved.

6. The Foundations of Mohist Morality

An intriguing question concerns how the different "Tests of Doctrine" (and thus the criterion of moral rightness to which each corresponds) relate to each other and whether any among them is the ultimate criterion to which the others can be reduced.

Of the three main "Tests," the second one (conformity to the teaching and practice of the ancient sage kings), is most easily shown to be derivative. The core chapters define the sage (and the related "benevolent man," which means roughly "ideal ruler" in context) as someone whose business it is to bring about order to the world ("Impartial Concern" A) or to promote the world's welfare and eliminate things that harm it ("Impartial Concern" B, C, "Frugality in Funerals," "Against Music"). In "Heaven's Will," on the other hand, the ancient sages are cited as examples of those who conducted themselves in accordance with Heaven's will. In summary, the ancient sages are presented by the Mohists as widely acknowledged exemplars of past rulers who successfully conducted themselves according to the Way, and the very reason why they are acknowledged to be sage kings is precisely because they taught sound doctrine and practiced the Way.

Given the wider cultural setting and prevailing rhetorical conventions, the Mohists' extensive appeal to the example and authority of the ancient sages is entirely understandable. Whatever their actual attitudes concerning the deeds and writings of the ancient sages as constituting a criterion of sound doctrine, the Mohists present themselves as addressing people who take the moral example of the ancient sages seriously. In this, their rhetorical practices do not differ from those of the Confucians. The two groups even share an overlapping taste in their choice of favored ancient sages: Yao, Shun, Yu, Tang, Wen, and Wu.

This leaves Heaven's Will and good consequences for the welfare of the world as criteria of sound doctrine. There is a strong tradition of modern interpreters, such as Fung Yu-lan, Angus C. Graham, and Benjamin Schwartz, who see the latter as primary and take Mohist doctrine to exemplify a form of utilitarianism. Other scholars, such as Dennis M. Ahren, David E. Soles, and Augustine Tseu, see the former as suggesting a divine command theory of morality, although this interpretation has been criticized by Kristopher Duda among others.  This controversy is not well framed if it is stated purely in terms of the modern and somewhat alien categories of command theory and utilitarianism (or consequentialism). But this criticism aside, the genuine question remains as to how "Heaven's Will" and "good consequences" relate to each other as criteria of the morally right.

In favor of the position that the criterion of good consequences is ultimate, it may be pointed out that even within the "Heaven's Will" chapters, the Mohists argue on the basis that certain ways of conduct are in accordance with Heaven's Will because they promote the public good. It is further claimed that Heaven desires that people do certain sorts of things or conduct themselves in a certain manner because such conduct will promote the public good, an outcome that Heaven desires. These considerations suggest that the criterion of Heaven's Will might ultimately be reducible to that of good consequences.

In response, it is at least possible that while the question what ways of conduct are morally right? is always answerable in terms of whether or not a way of conduct promotes good consequences, the separate question of why these ways of conduct (picked out using the criterion of good consequences) are ultimately obligatory is answered with reference to Heaven's Will.  If this is right, then there is a sense in which the two criteria neither reduce to each other nor potentially conflict, as they answer to different concerns altogether.

In any case, almost all of the Mohists' proposals are explicitly defended on the basis that adopting them will promote the public good. We might thus modestly conclude that whatever the final status of Heaven's Will as a criterion of the morally right, good consequences for the world is the operational criterion by which the Mohists evaluate various doctrines and the ways of conduct they verbalize.  This conclusion is lent further support by the fact that Heaven's Will almost never features as an explicit part of the Mohists' arguments for their specific proposals outside of the "Heaven's Will" chapters.

7. Impartial Concern

Whether "Heaven's will" or "good consequences for the world" forms the ultimate criterion of the morally right, the most salient first-order ethical injunction in Mohist doctrine remains that of "impartial concern" (jian'ai).  This is an injunction that is argued for both on the basis that it exemplifies Heaven's Will (in the "Heaven's Will" triad) and that it is conducive to the order and welfare of the world (in the "Impartial Concern" triad). In addition, the presentation of the doctrine (in all versions of "Impartial Concern") strongly suggests that it is meant to be the panacea for all that is seriously wrong with the world and, to that extent, identifies the main substance of the Mohists' Way.

As earlier indicated, "impartial concern" might be stated as the injunction that people ought to be concerned for the welfare of others without making distinctions between self and others, associates and strangers. Scrutiny of the core chapters, however, suggests both more and less stringent interpretations of what it entails by way of conduct. At one extreme, the injunction seems to require that people ought (to seek) to benefit strangers as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves. At the other extreme, it only requires that people refrain from harming strangers as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves. A third, intermediate possibility says that people ought (to seek) to help strangers with urgent needs as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves.

The least stringent interpretation is implied by passages (in all versions of "Impartial Concern") where the injunction is argued for on the basis that adopting it will put a stop to the violent inter-personal and inter-group conflicts that beset the world, since on the Mohist account, it is people's tendency to act on the basis of a greater regard for their own welfare over that of others, and that of their associates over that of strangers, that led them to have no qualms about benefiting themselves or their own associates at the expense of others and even to do so using violent means. The injunction of "impartial concern" is meant to be a reversal of this tendency. On the other hand, the more demanding interpretations are suggested especially by "Impartial Concern C," in which it is said that if the doctrine is adopted b people, then not only will people not fight, the welfare of the weak and disadvantaged will be taken care of by those better endowed.

Whichever interpretation is taken, the basic injunction points toward an underlying notion of impartiality. We can take "impartial concern" as making explicit the notion that the common benefit of the world is, in some sense, impartially the benefit of everyone.

In "Impartial Concern" C, the Mohists put forward an interesting thought experiment ostensibly to show that even people who are committed to being more concerned for the welfare of self that for that of others, and associates than strangers have some reason to value impartial concern. They described a scenario in which the audience is asked to imagine that they are about to go on a long journey and need to put their family members in the care of another.  The Mohists claim that the obvious and rational choice would be to put one's family members in the care of an impartialist rather than a partialist (that is, someone who is committed to "impartial concern" as opposed to someone who is committed to the opposite).

There are several problems with this argument. It seems to involve a false dilemma since the options of impartialist and partialist hardly exhaust the range of possible choices.  Even if the Mohists were correct to claim that the impartialist is the obvious and rational choice, all it shows is that partialists have good reason to prefer that other people conduct themselves according to the dictates of impartial concern, rather than that they have reason to so conduct themselves, as Chad Hansen and Bryan W. Van Norden have pointed out.  In defense of the Mohists, however, it might be the case that they are ultimately only concerned to establish that even partialists have reason to propagate the Mohists' doctrine of impartial concern, a conclusion that could follow from their argument.

8. Moral Psychology and Human Nature

Mohist doctrine as it is presented in the core chapters does not contain explicit discussions of the psychological aspects of the ethical life.  "Human nature" (xing), a term that plays an important role in the thinking of the Confucian thinkers Mencius and Xunzi, as well as Yang Zhu, does not even appear in the core chapters. Nonetheless, various aspects of Mohist doctrine might well entail commitments to potentially controversial positions in moral psychology and the theory of human nature.

Consider the Mohists' reply to the main objection raised against their doctrine of "impartial concern" -- that the doctrine is overly demanding, given that people in general just do not have the motivational resources to act according to its dictates ("Impartial Concern" B and C). Citing historical accounts, the Mohists respond that the requirements of "impartial concern" are no harder than the sorts of things that rulers in the past had been able to demand and get from their subjects, such as reducing one's diet, wearing coarse clothing, and charging into flames at the ruler's command. It was because the rulers delighted in such actions and offered suitable incentives to encourage them that they were done, even on a regular basis. The Mohists conclude that people in general can be made to practice "impartial concern" as long as rulers delight in it and offer the right incentives to encourage it.

On the basis of passages such as this one, David S. Nivison and Bryan W. Van Norden argue that either the Mohists held the view that human nature is infinitely malleable or they thought that there is no human nature. Such a reading focuses on the extravagant claim made in the text that as long as the rulers delight in "impartial concern" and offer the right incentives, human beings (especially the structure of their motivations) can be radically changed "within a single generation."  While this interpretation certainly is compatible with the tenor of the text, it is not necessarily the only possible interpretation.  After all, all that is needed for the Mohists to make their reply is the thought that people -- given their nature -- can be made to practice "impartial concern" through offering them the right leadership and incentives. They hardly need the stronger (and less plausible) claim that people can be remolded in any fashion whatsoever given the right leadership and incentives. Furthermore, at least some of the historical examples cited by the Mohists suggest that they are thinking more of the people responding to incentives in the environment (e.g., the comfort-loving courtier wearing coarse clothing or going on a diet so as to please the ruler) rather than more radical changes to the structure of their motivations (as might be suggested by the story of the soldiers who have been conditioned to charge into flames on the ruler's command).

A weaker and to that extent more defensible interpretation is that the Mohists do not consider the Way in a Mencian sense -- as "the realization of certain inclinations that human beings already share," as Shun Kwong-loi puts it. To be more precise, the Mohists do not appear to have considered the inclinations and predispositions that people already have as pointing to the contents of the Way. But they need not deny that these inclinations might, under suitable conditions (e.g., under a suitable regime of incentives), furnish the motivational resources for an agent to conduct himself well (the "Mohist" Yi Zhi in Mencius 3A5 seems to have taken a version of such a position) -- as long as it is recalled that what counts as "conducting oneself well" is given by something else other than those inclinations or their development: sound doctrine established by rational arguments. Seen this way, the Mohists would be in direct opposition to Mencius, insofar as Mencius regards those "inclinations that human beings already share" (explicitly construed within the context of an account of human nature) as providing both the contents of morality and the motivational resources for moral cultivation.

9. Government

The Mohists' political ideal is most prominently stated in the "Elevating the Worthy" and "Exalting Unity" chapters, which include the only theses that are explicitly said to identify "fundamentals of governance" (wei zheng zhi ben).

The "Exalting Unity" triad of chapters contains a "state of nature" argument that bears comparison both with ideas found in the Confucian philosopher Xunzi and perhaps more remotely, Thomas Hobbes' Leviathan and the social contract tradition of early modern European thought. As with the latter, it is at least arguable that even though the account is couched as if making historical claims about how human beings were like in a distant past "before there were any laws and criminal punishment" (version A) or "before there were rulers or leaders" (versions B and C), its logic is better appreciated if taken as a thought experiment of what things would be like were certain hypothetical conditions to hold.

The most important implications of such a hypothesis, for the Mohists, is that people will hold to different and conflicting opinions about what is morally right (yi), on the basis of which they will condemn each other. The end result is a state of violent conflict and chaos. This chaos is fully resolved only with the installment of a hierarchy of rulers and leaders consistently enforcing a unified conception of what is morally right through surveillance and incentives. The conclusion of the argument is that such a solution is a necessary condition for social and political order.

The "Elevating the Worthy" triad of chapters, on the other hand, proposes that good governance requires that the state cultivate worthy and capable people and employ them as officials, whatever their social origin. This doctrine opposes a form of meritocracy to the nepotism and cronyism prevalent among the rulers. It also insists that if the doctrine is to be successfully carried though, the rulers need to confer high rank, generous stipend and real power upon the worthy. Interestingly, in arguing for the doctrine, version B both traces it to the practices of the ancient sage kings and also says that the ancients were modeling their regime upon Heaven, thus suggesting that an application of the criterion of "Heaven's will" in involved. Nonetheless, the main thrust of all three versions remains that meritocracy will bring great benefits to the state.

10. Frugality

Three of the ten core Mohist theses are related to the virtue of frugality: "Frugality in Expenditures," "Frugality in Funerals," and "Against Music."  For the most part, the arguments in these chapters are paradigmatic cases of "good consequences to the welfare of the world" as criterion of the morally right. (As mentioned earlier, a lengthy elaboration of the criterion can be found in the opening parts of "Frugality in Funerals.") In "Frugality in Expenditures," the criterion is applied positively through showing that the preferred policy of government thrift brings about beneficial consequences. In the other two triads, the criterion is applied negatively through detailing the harmful consequences that attend elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning, and extravagant music displays of the aristocracy.

One interesting feature of the arguments in these chapters is the weight given to the welfare of the common people in the Mohists' calculation of the benefit and harm that result from the policy under assessment. This aspect of Mohist doctrine is especially prominent in "Against Music," where a large part of what counts as the "good consequences" of a policy is articulated in terms of the common people receiving enough to eat, being protected from the elements and having sufficient rest. It thus seems that, despite their commitment to "impartial concern," the Mohists have a partisan concern for the interests of the lower social classes. The more charitable interpretation, however, is that they are accommodating concerns in the region of distributive justice. That is, the common benefit of the world is in some sense impartially and equally the benefit of everyone; but since the Mohists -- like most thinkers in ancient China -- do not envision a radical elimination of the vast social, economic and political inequalities that are simply a fact of life in Warring States China, the distributive concerns are met by giving extra weight to the interests of the disadvantaged. This reading is also consonant with their claim that were "impartial concern" to be widely practice, the welfare of the weak and disadvantaged will be taken care of by those better endowed (in "Impartial Concern C").

A more serious charge against the Mohists, however, is that their doctrine on frugality commits them to an overly restrictive and hence highly implausible conception of the good. The Confucian thinker Xunzi defends elaborate Confucian funeral rituals and musical displays against Mohist attacks by claiming that they given form to, and meet, the emotional needs of people. Conversely, Mohist doctrine simply fails to take into account aspects of the human good not reducible to material livelihood. Insofar as Mohist doctrine does imply such a reduced conception of the human good, this is a cogent objection.

But insofar as the main weight of the Mohist arguments lies in the thought that it is unjust of the aristocrats to provide for their own emotional needs (through elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning) or refined enjoyment (though elaborate musical displays) through an imposition upon the labor of the common people, the objection is not decisive. Interestingly enough, that this what the Mohists have in mind is indicated in "Against Music." The text apologizes for attacking the aristocracy's musical displays by conceding that while music and other refinements are "delightful," they bring no benefit to the common people and, in fact, harm their livelihood.

11. Just War

The Mohists reserved some of their most trenchant condemnations against military aggression, asserting that offensive war is harmful to the welfare of the world and contrary to Heaven's will. One argument (two variations of which can be found in "Against Military Aggression" A and "Heaven's Will" C) proceeds by claiming that there is an analogy between the actions of a military aggressor and those of people who steal or rob others or who murder. And since (as even the audience agrees) stealing, robbing and murdering are morally wrong, and since actions that cause greater harm to others are, to that extent, greater wrongs, military aggression is a great wrong indeed.

Another series of arguments (in "Against Military Aggression" B and C) proceeds by pointing out in some detail the economic and human cost of military aggression even to the aggressors. To the reply that some of the Warring States appear to have greatly profited from their aggressive ways, the Mohists point out that they are the rare exceptions and seeking profit by such means is tantamount to calling a medication effective that cured four or five out of myriads.

Perhaps as befits the difference in addressee, the second set of arguments appears more pragmatic as it appeals to the "war-loving" rulers' sense of self-interest. The earlier argument, on the other hand, appears to aim showing the gentlemen of the world that they ought to condemn military aggression if they are to be consistent with their own normative convictions -- if they know that stealing, robbing and murdering is wrong and blameworthy, they ought also to consider military aggression wrong and blameworthy.

The objection is raised in "Against Military Aggression" C that the ancient sage kings waged war, and since they are supposed to be models of moral rectitude, it follows that war cannot be unqualifiedly wrong. In response, the Mohists introduce a distinction between justified and unjustified warfare, claiming that the former was waged by the righteous ancient sage rulers to overthrow evil tyrants. The precise criterion of the distinction between the two forms of warfare, however, is not explicitly spelled out in that chapter. Instead, justified warfare is associated with supernatural signs indicating that Heaven has given the ruler a mandate to wage war so as to visit condign punishment upon some wicked tyrant. This is surprising since elsewhere ("Impartial Concern" C), the Mohists present the sage Yu's military campaigns to pacify the unruly Miao tribes as an example of his "impartial concern" for the welfare of the people of the world. This suggests that there are ample resources within Mohist doctrine to spell out the distinction in less exotic terms. But since they did connect the distinction between justified and unjustified warfare to Heaven and the spirits, a discussion of the Mohists' religious views is in order.

12. Heaven and Spirits

Within the core chapters, the Mohists consistently portray Heaven as if it possesses personal characteristics and exists separately from human beings, though intervening in their affairs. In particular, they present Heaven if it is an entity having will and desire, and concerned about the welfare of the people of the world, even a providential agent that rewards the just and punishes the wicked through its control of natural phenomena or by means of its superhuman intermediaries, the spirits (guishen). Finally, Heaven and the spirits are also portrayed as the objects of reverence, sacrificial offerings and supplication ("Heaven's Will" B).

Apart from the earlier mentioned role of Heaven's will in providing a criterion for what is morally right, the Mohists also blame people's loss of belief in the existence, power and providential character of spirits for the perceived immorality and chaos of their time. This motivates them to argue that such spirits do exist in "Elucidating the Spirits."  But the Mohists' considered position with regards to the existence of providential spirits as opposed to the usefulness of a widespread belief in their existence is an ambiguous one at best. While the first parts of "Elucidating the Spirits" seem aimed at establishing that the spirits exist (by appealing to the testimony of people sense of sight and hearing), the bulk of the arguments in the chapter are better taken as attempts to show that it is socially and politically beneficial that people in general believe in the existence of providential spirits and that the government organize its affairs on the basis that they exist. As the text puts it:

If the fact that ghosts and spirits reward the worthy and punish the evil can be made a cornerstone of policy in the state and impressed upon the common people, it will provide a means to bring order to the state and benefit to the people.

In this regard, an argument that appears towards the end of the chapter is most telling. To the objection that the doctrine on spirits entails the need to sacrifice to them, which in turn interferes with one's duties towards one's living parents, the Mohists reply that if the spirits do exist, then the sacrifices cannot be considered a waste of resources; but if they do not exist, then the community can still come together to share in the communion of the sacrificial wine and millet and the sacrifice will still serve a socially useful function. The argument implies that what the Mohists are ultimately concerned to argue for is neutral with respect to whether or not providential spirits actually exist, as the author and Benjamin Wong have pointed out.

13. References and Further Reading

  • Ahern, Dennis M. "Is Mo Tzu a Utilitarian?" Journal of Chinese Philosophy 3 (1976): 185-193.
  • Duda, Kristopher. "Reconsidering Mo Tzu on the Foundations of Morality." Asian Philosophy 11/1 (2001): 23-31.
  • Fung Yu-lan. A History of Chinese Philosophy. 2 vols. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1952-53.
  • Graham, Angus C. Divisions in Early Mohism Reflected in the Core Chapters of Mo-tzu. Singapore: Institute of East Asian Philosophies, 1985.
  • Graham, Angus C. Later Mohist Logic, Ethics, and Science. Hong Kong: Chinese University Press / London: School of Oriental and African Studies, 1978; reprinted 2003.
  • Hansen, Chad. A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought: A Philosophical Interpretation. New York: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Hsiao Kung-chuan. A History of Chinese Political Thought, Vol. 1: From the Beginnings to the Sixth Century A. D. Trans. F. W. Mote. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979.
  • Hu Shih. The Development of the Logical Method in Ancient China. 2nd edition. New York: Paragon Book Reprint Corp., 1963.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. "Mohist Philosophy."  In Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed.  Edward Craig (London and New York: Routledge, 1998), 6:451-458.
  • Knoblock, John, trans.  Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works. 3 vols. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1988-94.
  • Lai, Whalen. "The Public Good that does the Public Good: A New Reading of Mohism." Asian Philosophy 3/2 (1993): 125-141.
  • Lowe, Scott. Mo Tzu's Religious Blueprint for a Chinese Utopia: The Will and the Way. Ontario: Edwin Mellen Press, 1992.
  • Loy, Hui-chieh. "On a Gedankenexperiment in the Mozi Core Chapters." Oriens Extremus 45 (2005): 141-158.
  • Maeder, Erik W. "Some Observations on the Composition of the €˜Core Chapters' of the Mozi." Early China 17 (1992): 27-82.
  • Mei, Yi-pao. Mo-tse, the Neglected Rival of Confucius. London: Arthur Probsthain, 1934.
  • Mei, Yi-pao. The Ethical and Political Works of Motse. London: Arthur Probsthain, 1929.
  • Nivison, David S. The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Bryan W. Van Norden. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1996.
  • Pines, Yuri. Foundations of Confucian Thought: Intellectual life in the Chunqiu Period, 722-453 B.C.E. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2002.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin. The World of Thought in Ancient China. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1985.
  • Shaughnessy, Edward L., and Michael Loewe, eds. The Cambridge History of Ancient China: From the Beginnings of Civilization to 221 b.c. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. Mencius and Early Chinese Thought. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
  • Soles, David E. "Mo Tzu and the foundations of Morality." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 26/1 (1999): 37-48.
  • Taylor, Rodney L. "Religion and utilitarianism: Mo Tzu on spirits and funerals." Philosophy East and West 29/3 (July 1979): 337-346.
  • Tseu, Augustine. The Moral Philosophy of Mozi. Taipei: China Printing Limited, 1965.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W. "A Response to the Mohist Arguments in €˜Impartial Caring.'"  In The Moral Circle and the Self: Chinese and Western Approaches, eds. Kim-chong Chong, Sor-Hoon Tan and C. L. Ten (Chicago: Open Court, 2003), 41-58.
  • Vorenkamp, Dirck. "Another Look at Utilitarianism in Mo Tzu's Thought." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 19 (1992): 423-443.
  • Watson, Burton, trans. Mo Tzu: Basic Writings. Columbia University Press, 1963.
  • Wong, Benjamin, and Hui-chieh Loy. "War and Ghosts in Mozi's Political Philosophy." Philosophy East and West 54/3 (2004): 343­-363.
  • Wong, David B. "Mohism: The Founder, Mozi (Mo Tzu)."  In Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. Antonio S. Cua (London and New York: Routledge, 2003), 453-461.
  • Wong, David B.  "Universalism versus Love with Distinctions: An Ancient Debate Revived." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 16/3-4 (September-December 1989): 251-272.
  • Yates, Robin D.S. "The Mohists on Warfare: Technology, Technique, and Justification." Journal of the AmericanAcademy of Religion 47 (1979): 549-603.

Author Information

Hui-chieh Loy
National University of Singapore

Modern Chinese Philosophy

The term “modern Chinese philosophy” is used here to denote various Chinese philosophical trends in the short period between the implementation of the constitutional “new policy” (1901) and the abolition of the traditional examination system (1905) in the late Qing (Ch’ing) dynasty and the rise and fall of the Republic of China in mainland China (1911-1949). As an ancient cultural entity, China seemed to be frozen in a time capsule for thousands of years until it suddenly defrosted as a direct result of military invasions and exploitation by the West and Japan since the Opium War of 1839-42. Thus, one may argue that China had longer “classical” and “medieval” periods than the West, whereas its “modern” period began relatively recently. Modern Chinese philosophy is rooted historically in the traditions of Buddhism, Confucianism, especially Neo-Confucianism, and the Xixue (“Western Learning,” that is, mathematics, natural sciences and Christianity) that arose during the late Ming Dynasty (ca. 1552-1634) and flourished until the early Republic Period (1911-1923). In particular, the Jingxue (School of Classical Studies), or classical Confucianism, developed in the early Qing dynasty, which critiqued Neo-Confucian thought as impractical and subjective and instead championed a pragmatic approach to resolving China’s dilemmas as a nation, exerting a powerful influence on the development of modern Chinese philosophy. Modern Chinese philosophers typically responded to critiques of their heritage by both Chinese and Western thinkers either by transforming Chinese tradition (as in the efforts of Zhang Zhidong and Sun Yat-sen), defending it (as in the work of traditional Buddhists and Confucians), or opposing it altogether (as in the legacy of the May Fourth New Cultural Movement, including both its liberal and its communist exponents). Many modern Chinese philosophers advanced some form of political philosophy that simultaneously promoted Chinese national confidence while problematizing China’s cultural and intellectual traditions. In spite of this, a striking feature of most modern Chinese philosophy is its retrieval of traditional Chinese thought as a resource for addressing 20th century concerns.

Table of Contents

  1. Dividing Chinese Philosophy into Periods
  2. Historical Background
  3. The Transformational Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Zhang Zhidong
    2. Sun Yat-sen
    3. Chinese Scholasticism
  4. The Anti-Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Yan Fu and Western Learning
    2. The May Fourth New Cultural Movement
    3. Hu Shi
    4. Chen Duxiu
    5. The Debate of 1923
  5. The Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Yang Rensan and the Buddhist Renaissance
    2. Ou-Yang Jingwu and the Chinese Academy of Buddhism
    3. Liang Shuming and Neo-Confucianism
    4. Fung Yulan and Neo-Confucianism
    5. Carsun Chang and Neo-Confucianism
    6. Xiong Shili and Neo-Confucianism
    7. Wang Kuowei and Classical Confucianism
    8. Thome Fang and Classical Confucianism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Dividing Chinese Philosophy into Periods

The term “modern Chinese philosophy” is used here to denote various Chinese philosophical trends in the short period between the implementation of the constitutional “new policy” (1901) and the abolition of the traditional examination system (1905) in the late Qing Dynasty and the rise and fall of the Republic of China in mainland China (1911-1949). Admittedly, the term “modern philosophy” often refers to Western philosophy since the 17th century , characterized by the critical and independent spirit inspired by the Scientific Revolution, but there is no counterpart to this movement in 17th-19th century Chinese intellectual history. As an antique, independent cultural entity, China seemed to be frozen in a time capsule for thousands of years until it suddenly defrosted as a direct result of military invasions and exploitation by the West and Japan since the Opium War of 1839-42. Thus, one may argue that China had longer “classical” and “medieval” periods than the West, whereas its “modern” period began relatively recently.

With this demarcation in mind, the history of Chinese philosophy can be divided into five phases: the ancient (ca. 1000 BCE-588 CE), the medieval (589-959 CE), the Renaissance (960-1900 CE), the modern (1901-1949 CE), and the contemporary (after 1949 CE). Roughly speaking, many parallels to the history of Western philosophy can be discerned in this division. Like Greek philosophy, ancient Chinese philosophy was dominated by a spirit of fundamental humanism rather than theistic enthusiasm. Like Christian scholasticism, medieval Chinese philosophy was dominated by a religious concern displayed in the teachings of the multifarious Buddhist schools. The Renaissance of Chinese philosophy may be found in the Neo-Confucian movement that lasted for one thousand years through four dynasties: the Song (960-1279), Yuan (1280-1367), Ming (1368-1643) and Qing (1644-1911). Finally, all schools of modern and contemporary Western thought have prompted modern and contemporary Chinese philosophy to respond to their profound challenges. These various modes of response include the affirmation of tradition, the transformation of tradition, and the abandonment of tradition, once and for all. Collectively, these three modes of response function as the background to the development of modern Chinese philosophy and also help identify three of its major trends: the transformational trend (represented by Zhang Zhidong and Sun Yat-sen), the traditional trend (represented by traditional Buddhism, classical Confucianism, and Neo-Confucianism, respectively), and the anti-traditional trend (represented by the Liberalism and the Communism fostered by the May Fourth New Cultural Movement). While there have been various developments within other minor schools, only the major strains of thought will be treated briefly here.

2. Historical Background

Liang Qichao (1873-1930), a renowned early 20th century Chinese philosopher, suggested in his The Chinese Academic History in the Past Three Hundred Years (Zhongkuo jinsanbainien xueshushi) that modern Chinese philosophy was rooted in the traditions of classical Confucianism, Neo-Confucianism, Pure Land Buddhism, and the Xixue (“Western Learning,” that is, mathematics, natural sciences and Christianity) that arose during the late Ming Dynasty (ca. 1552-1634) and flourished until the early Republic Period (1911-1923). As he noted, there were two Confucian traditions handed down from the Han dynasty (206 BCE-220 CE) to the early Qing dynasty, namely, classical Confucianism (Jingxue) and Neo-Confucianism (Lixue). The so-called Lixue or Daoxue (the learning of reasons or of universal principles), represented in the Song dynasty by Zhu Xi’s Lixue (Rationalism) and Lu Xiangshan’s Xinxue (Idealism) and in the Ming dynasty by Wang Yangming (a follower of Lu), can be regarded as a renaissance of the ideal of humanity within Confucianism, yet it is a syncretic system composed of various elements of Chan (Zen) Buddhism, sectarian Daoism, and Confucianism (mainly based on the Analects, Mencius , Daxue (Great Learning), Zhongyong (Doctrine of the Mean), and the Xicixuan (Conspectus of the Book of Changes), the first four of which Zhu Xi annotated and entitled the Four Books, which became the corpus of Neo-Confucian teaching).

In opposition to the Neo-Confucian approach, there emerged the so-called Jingxue (School of Classics Studies) or classical Confucianism developed in the early Qing dynasty that was founded on the study of the “Six Classics,” that is the Yijing (Book of Changes), the Shujing (Classic of Ancient History), the Shijing (Classic of Poetry), the now-lost Yuejing (Classic of Music), the Lijing (Classic of Propriety), and the Chunqiu (Annals of the Spring and Autumn Period). Liang argued that the major difference between the two is that Neo-Confucianism places great emphasis on abstractions such as xin (mind), xing (human nature), li (reason), and qi (material-force) and demonstrates little concern for practical affairs such as economic, political, and military knowledge that will strengthen the national defense, benefit the public welfare, and promote people’s livelihood. To find a scapegoat for the collapse of the Ming dynasty (the last imperial regime led by ethnic Chinese), many late Ming intellectuals blamed Wang Yangming’s idealism for the ruin of their country. Thus the Jingxue thinkers urged Confucius’ genuine followers to turn to the original Confucian teachings through exegesis, not only of the Four Books, but of the Six Classics, which they supposed to be uncontaminated by Buddhism and Daoism. As they observed, Confucius taught his students with “Six Arts” (ritual, music, archery, horse-riding, calligraphy, and mathematics), which were the basic requirements for a gentleman of the pre-Qin era. These thinkers regarded the “Six Arts” as examples of practical learning and claimed that Confucius never made impractical, soul-seeking meditation or discussions of mind, spirit, and human nature the primal tasks of learning. In contrast to the subjective, idealistic approach applied by Wang Yangming’s school, the Jingxue thinkers promoted what they saw as a more realistic, objective approach to the study of the Classics and the pursuit of practical knowledge of agriculture, public administration, economics, national defense, and so forth. Among them, Ku Yanwu (1613-1682), Yan Yuan (1635-1704), and Dai Zhen (1724-1777) made great contributions to late Ming pragmatism. Their criticisms of Neo-Confucianism are still wielded with some force by those who critique Neo-Confucian thought today.

Another major intellectual trend that had exercised great influence on modern Chinese philosophy was Buddhism, a foreign religion that first came to China in the late Han dynasty. From then onward, Buddhism became popular with ordinary people as a folk belief for its promise to satisfy their secular needs, and gradually became attractive to scholars for the complexity and intricacy of its metaphysical and psychological theories. Imbued with the humanistic teaching of traditional philosophy, Chinese scholars found the Buddhist doctrines of “emptiness” (sunyata) and “non-self” or “self-denial” (wuwo) unacceptable until they were rendered intelligible and transformed in terms of the Daoist doctrines of “non-being” (wu) and “self-abstention” (wuyu), using the philosophical method of geyi (analogous interpretation) produced by the Neo-Daoists of the 3rd to 5th centuries CE. Once thus accepted, the Buddhist doctrines flourished in the Sui (590-617) and Tang (618-906) dynasties, during which four major Chinese Buddhist schools developed: the Huayan (“Flower Garland,” based on the Flower Ornament Sutra]), Tiantai (“Heavenly Platform,” based on the Lotus Sutra), Chan (“Meditation”–better known by its Japanese equivalent, Zen--based on the Vajracchedika Sutra and the Lankavatatra Sutra), and Jingtu (“Pure Land,” based on the Amitayus Sutra). Among these schools of Chinese Buddhism, the greatest tension has existed between Chan, which has maintained an iconoclastic attitude toward traditional Buddhist precepts and scriptural study, and “Pure Land,” whose theistic and ritualistic flavor helped to ensure its widespread popularity beginning in the Ming dynasty.

Finally, all schools of modern Chinese philosophy have submitted themselves to tremendous influence from “Western Learning” or Xixue, which flourished between the late Ming dynasty and the early Qing dynasty through the importation of Western astronomy, geometry, geography, mathematics, and natural sciences along with Christianity by Jesuit missionary scholars such as Matteo Ricci (1552-1610). With the help of Chinese scholars Xu Gunag-chi (1561-1633), Li Zhizao (1565-1630), and others, Ricci translated Euclid’s geometrical text The Elements. His work Shiyi (True Ideas of God ) introduced the scholastic concepts of “being,” “substance,” “essence,” and “existence” with a view to synthesizing the Christian view of the soul with the Confucian theory of human nature. The prospect of “Western Learning” was suddenly squelched by the Qing emperor Yongzheng (r. 1723-1735) on the grounds that the Jesuits were interfering in court politics. “Western Learning” was revived after the Opium War, however, and soon came into vogue among Chinese thinkers who opposed tradition in the name of “modernization.” The result has been most vividly described by Wing-tsit Chan, who writes: “At the turn of the [20th] century, ideas of Schopenhauer, Kant, Nietzsche, Rousseau, Tolstoy, and Kropotkin were imported. After the intellectual renaissance of 1917, the movement advanced at a rapid pace. In the following decade, important works of Descartes, Spinoza, Hume, James, Bergson, and Marx, and others became available in Chinese. Dewey, Russell, and Dreisch came to China to lecture, and special numbers of journals were devoted to Nietzsche and Bergson… Almost every trend of thought had its exponent. James, Bergson, Euken, Whitehead, Hocking, Schiller, T. H. Creen, Carnap, and C. I. Lewis had their own following. For a time it seemed Chinese thought was to be completely Westernized.” (Chan 1963:743)

3. Transformational Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy

a. Zhang Zhidong

From the late 19th century to the first half of the 20th century, China suffered from ruthless exploitation and invasions by the Western powers and Japan. Trammeled by many unfair treaties signed by the defeated Qing government, China experienced a crisis of cultural self-confidence as its traditions shattered, its society disintegrated, and its empire perished. In the midst of this cultural, societal, and political turmoil, many intellectuals prescribed various remedies for the country’s survival; among them, Zhang Zhidong (1837-1909) was representative. In his Quanxue Pien (An Exhortation to Learning, 1898), Zhang called for importing Western industrial and economic knowledge and technology to meet China’s practical needs while at the same time preserving the leading position of Chinese traditional learning in theory. His response to the impact of Western knowledge is epitomized in the following phrases: “Taking Chinese learning as ‘substance,’ that is, the foundation of culture, and taking Western learning as ‘function’, that is, for the practical purpose and utility,” or to state briefly: “Chinese Learning as Substance and Western Learning as Function” (Zhongti Xiyong). This can be regarded as the first instance of the transformational trend in modern Chinese philosophy before the birth of modern China in 1911.

b. Sun Yat-sen

Sun Yat-sen (1866-1925), the Nationalist founder of the Republic of China, led the overthrow of the Qing regime in 1911 after a long series of revolutionary campaigns. Inspired by U.S. President Abraham Lincoln’s Gettysburg Address, in 1919 Sun articulated “Three Principles of the People” (Sanmin Zhuyi) on which the new democratic Republic of China was to be founded: the Principle of Nationalism (minzu zhuyi), the Principle of People’s Sovereignty (minquan zhuyi), and the Principle of People’s Livelihood (minsheng zhuyi).

The first principle, the Principle of Nationalism, which corresponds to Lincoln’s idea of “a government of the people,” maintains the equality of all ethnic groups in China proper and seeks equal national status for Chinese with all peoples of the world. This doctrine urges all ethnic groups (mainly the Han, Hui [Chinese Muslims], Manchus, Mongolians, and Tibetans) in China to unite as one nation so as to retrieve China’s national self-confidence and revitalize its national creativity. According to Sun, his Nationalism promoted eight kinds of national virtues: loyalty, fidelity, benevolence, love, honesty, justice, harmony, and peace, all of which have their origin in Chinese traditional culture but must be transformed to meet with the urgent needs of modern society.

The second principle, the Principle of People’s Sovereignty, which corresponds to Lincoln’s idea of “a government by the people,” holds that Chinese people must fight for their sovereignty through revolutions in order to set up a democratic government. According to Sun, Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s ideas that all men are born equal and people’s sovereignty is given by nature are merely ideals or theoretical hypotheses found in classic political texts. In human history, insisted Sun, no evidence can be found to support Rousseau’s views, and it was only through bloodshed that people ever acquired their power, sovereignty, and equality. Thus, Sun urged all Chinese to stand up for their rights, and to fight for their freedom and equality by joining the course of revolution. Influenced by the meritocratic Confucian civil service system of traditional China, Sun urged that most of the executive offices of the government be assigned by way of examination, instead of election. This is to separate people’s power from ability, so that people hold the power to govern while officials have the ability to serve (quanneng qufen).

The third principle, the Principle of People’s Livelihood, which corresponds to Lincoln’s idea of “a government for the people,” claims to provide a middle course between capitalism and communism and to avoid either extreme by substituting the idea of “cooperative economy” for that of “the free market.” Based on the Principle of People’s Livelihood, Sun argued for the adoption of two policies: (a) equalization of land ownership through taxation of property, and (b) restriction of private capital and expansion of state capital. Accordingly, the government should monopolize ownership and management of electricity, banking, mass transportation, and so forth, and leave medium- and small-sized businesses free room for their own development. Thus, the third Principle takes people’s livelihood in food, clothing, housing, and transportation to be of primary importance and demands that government assume full responsibility for this.

Above all, Sun proclaimed that his “Three Principles of the People” combined the choicest parts of Chinese and Western thinking with the Golden Mean (zhongyong) as a guideline derived from Chinese tradition. For example, the Principle of People’s Sovereignty accepts the Western idea of democracy but denies its origination from “natural law ”; as Sun observed, “all men are born unequal,” and those born with more intelligence and capability should serve those less favored by birth with compassion. To philosophers who demand scientific rigor and logical consistency, Sun’s synthesis may not sound convincing, and may seem to be largely based on personal observations and experience without theoretical justifications. However, from a historical perspective, Sun’s “Three Principles” may be seen as a major effort at introducing Western democratic ideas into China. In this sense, Sun’s attempt to combine Chinese tradition with Western modern thinking should be regarded as a typical example of the transformational trend in modern Chinese philosophy.

c. Chinese Scholasticism

The person who carried on the Christian tradition of Matteo Ricci in the early 20th century was Wu Jingxiong (1899-1986), also known as John C. H. Wu. A Roman Catholic and a scholar of jurisprudence, Wu became the first Chinese to translate the Bible into classical Chinese at the request of the Nationalist leader Chiang Kai-shek (1887-1975) in the 1930s. Wu saw Confucianism, Daoism and Chan Buddhism as the main currents in Chinese philosophy. He then tried to combine the Aristotelian-Thomistic tradition with Chinese philosophy. In many of his works, such as “Mencius’ Theory of Human Nature and Natural Law,” “My Philosophy of Law: Natural Law in Evolution,” and “Comparative Studies in the Philosophy of Natural Law,” Wu argued that the Confucian Dao consists of a number of ethical principles which are parallel to the “natural laws” in Christian scholasticism. For instance, the Confucian concepts of “Heavenly Mandate” (tianming), “human nature,” and “edification” assume many similarities to the “eternal law,” “natural law,” and “positive law” of scholastic philosophy. (Shen 1993: 282-283) In a small pamphlet entitled “Joy in Chinese Philosophy,” published in the 1940s, Wu explicitly pointed out that Confucianism, Daoism and Chan Buddhism all display a kind of spiritual joy that can be subsumed under Christian joy. The Chinese scholastic tradition is still carried on today, with Fu Jen Catholic University in Taiwan as its center.

4. Anti-Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy

a. Yan Fu and Western Learning

The importation of Western science into China, prohibited since the early Qing, was renewed after the Opium War and gained tremendous momentum from the military supremacy of Western powers then invading China. To facilitate the introduction of Western military technology in manufacturing guns and building ships, the Jiangnan Arsenal, the first formal institution for Western learning in China, was established in 1865, followed by the construction of the Fuzhou Shipyard in 1866. The Qing government then changed its policy of isolation and sent the first group of young children abroad for foreign studies in 1872. Nonetheless, China’s disastrous defeat in the Sino-Japanese War of 1894-95 further weakened Chinese confidence in traditional culture and generated even greater enthusiasm among intellectuals for the West as a complete source of knowledge. Yan Fu (1853-1921), who studied in England from 1877 to 1879, was the first Chinese scholar to introduce Western philosophy, science, and political theory systematically by translating Thomas Huxley’s Evolution and Ethics, Herbert Spencer’s Synthetic Philosophy, John Stuart Mill’s On Liberty, Montesquieu’s L’Esprit des lois, and Adam Smith’s Wealth of Nations into Chinese. (Fung 1976: 326) He advocated freedom of speech as the foundation of a civil society and thereby laid the foundation for democracy and liberalism to flourish in China in the early 20th century.

b. The May Fourth New Cultural Movement

Although he was an advocate of Western learning, Yan Fu rendered his translations of Western works in the archaic classical form of the Chinese language and consistently showed his respect for the traditional culture. In contrast, many of his followers turned their back on traditional culture and tried to forsake it completely. In fact, the major trend of modern Chinese philosophy could be characterized as an overall antagonism toward the intellectual and cultural traditions, which reached its height during the so-called “May Fourth New Cultural Movement” (wushi xinwenhua yundong). (Kwok 1965: 8-17)

Soon after Sun Yat-sen established the Republic of China, he was elected its President. He then abdicated his presidency to the warlord Yuan Shihkai (1859-1916). Yuan died after failing to restore the imperial regime with himself as emperor, leaving behind a corrupt government that secretly depended upon Japanese financing. In the beginning, the May Fourth Movement was purely a patriotic student movement provoked by the government’s intention to sign the Versailles Treaty (which promised to concede Germany’s monopoly in Shandong Province to Japan instead of giving it back to China, in spite of China’s contributions to the Allied Powers in the First World War). On May 4, 1919, Beijing University students demonstrated in protest against the government and burned the houses of the officials involved. The movement soon spread all over the whole country, many schools and business were closed down, and the Japanese goods were boycotted by the people as a sign of support for the student movement.

Politically, the movement was successful, as it prevented the government from signing the Versailles Treaty. But it also proved to be a fatal stroke to traditional culture and Chinese national confidence. Most of the student leaders in this movement, such as Hu Shi (1891-1962), Cai Yuanpei (1868-1940), Wu Zhihui (1865-1953), Wu Yu (1872-1949), Lo Jialun (1897-1969), Chen Duxiu (1897-1942), and Li Dazhao (1889-1927), later turned to the major figures of an even greater new cultural and political movement that was at first called the “Vernacular Movement” (paihaowen yundong), then the “New Cultural Movement” (xinwenhua yundong). The movement called for an overall reform of Chinese culture and made “Mr. Science and Ms. Democracy” its icons. The rebellious spirit provoked by the two slogans, which seemed to be the panacea for the desperate situation of China, ended by bringing about an extremely violent campaign against Confucianism. The movement then divided into two camps: one led by the liberal Hu Shi, the other led by the communist Chen Duxiu.

c. Hu Shi

Hu Shi, a student of John Dewey at Columbia University in the United States, invited his teacher to lecture at Shanghai when the May Fourth Movement broke out in Beijing. Hu soon became the chief leader of the New Cultural Movement by promoting a pragmatic, critical spirit and by applying “scientific method” in every branch of human studies. He proclaimed that archaic language failed to convey real-life experience and should be replaced by vernacular language in literature, that classical literature handed down from the remote past should be reexamined to determine whether it represented true experience or scholarly forgery, and that Confucianism had misled the Chinese people by teaching them to subordinate themselves to the authorities of sovereign, father, family, and the state. Similarly, Hu blamed Daoism for teaching the Chinese people to comply with nature, instead of understanding and controlling nature. Hu praised the early Chinese philosophical school known as Mohism--not because of its high moral commitment, but because he regarded it as possibly the earliest form of pragmatism in Chinese intellectual history. In this spirit of new literary movement, Hu Shi published the first book in Chinese vernacular language, Outlines of the History of Chinese Philosophy (1919), which dismissed the traditional sacred image of Confucianism. Above all, Hu advocated the scientific method in doing any research work with the maxim “make hypotheses boldly, but verify them carefully.” A believer in scientism, Hu advocated pragmatism and devalued traditional Chinese culture on the grounds that it was deficient in the elements of science and democracy.

d. Chen Duxiu

While Chen Duxiu shared Hu’s pro-democratic, pro-scientific, and anti-Confucian sentiments, he rejected Hu’s individualist liberalism and helped to found the Chinese Communist Party in 1921. Chen, editor of the most influential journal of the New Cultural Movement, New Youth, was influenced by French democratic thought and Russian Marxist theory. He saw Chinese traditions, chiefly Confucianism, as incompatible with science and democracy, and called for an end to what he saw as an emblem of obscurantism and dogmatism. Deeply impressed by French thinkers, he enumerated their achievements in democracy (as seen in the work of Lafayette and Seignobos), evolutionary theory (in Lamarck), and socialism (in Babeuf, Saint-Simon, and Fourier). Influenced by his predecessor Li Shizeng (1881-1973), the first Chinese to study in France and the transmitter of Pyotr Kropotkin’s anarchist doctrines prior to the May Fourth Movement, Chen once was an anarchist. He then came to embrace dialectical materialism and propagate Marxism strongly as the only remedy for a feeble China. In 1920, he wrote: “The republic cannot give happiness to the people…. Evolution goes from feudalism to republicanism and from republicanism to communism. I have said that the republic has failed and that feudalism has been reborn, but I hope that soon the feudal forces will be wiped out again by democracy and the latter by socialism…for I am convinced that the creation of a proletarian state is the most urgent revolution in China.” (Briere 1956: 24) These statements prefigure the birth of the People’s Republic of China which replaced the Republic of China as the regime in mainland China after 1949 and made Marxism the only authority in modern Chinese philosophy.

e. The Debate of 1923

The tide of anti-Confucianism reached another height in 1923 in “The Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists,” held chiefly by the geologist, Ding Wenjiang (1887-1936), and the Neo-Confucian thinker Zhang Junmei (1887-1969), later known as Carsun Chang. (Briere 1956: 16-17, 135-160; Kwok 1965: 29-31) Chang (Zhang), a disciple of Liang Qichao, gave a lecture on “the philosophy of life” at Qinghua University in Beijing in which he maintained that intuitive conscience and free will were the foundation of a happy life free from the sway of mechanical laws and argued that traditional Confucianism, including Neo-Confucianism, had made great contributions toward bringing about a great spiritual civilization by offering solutions for the problems of life to which science and technology had no answers. These remarks received an immediate rebuke from Ding in an article entitled “Science and Metaphysics,” in which he accused Chang of mixing Bergsonian intuitionism of élan vital with the intuitionism of Wang Yangming, thus recalling the specter of metaphysics in a positivist age. Ding, who championed the work of Darwin, Huxley, Spencer, et al, asserted that science is all-sufficient, not only in its subject matter, but also in its methodical procedure. According to Ding, science’s object is to search for universal truth by objectively excluding any personal, subjective prejudices, while the metaphysician can only introduce a supersensible world that is beyond human cognition and constructed from empty words.

In response, Chang retorted that manifestly there is knowledge outside of science, such as truths and hypotheses in philosophy and religion that cannot be verified by scientific criteria. Science, argued Chang, is far from being omnipotent: it is as limited in its scope as in its methods. Chang’s mentor, Liang Qichao, soon came to his aid and took on the role of an arbitrator in an article entitled “The View of Life and Science.” One the one hand, Liang criticized Chang for overstating the function of intuition and free will that leads to an undesirable subjective individualism and maintained that most of the “problems of life” can be solved with help of scientific knowledge. On the other hand, Liang supported Chang’s denial of the omnipotence of scientific knowledge and asserted that our understanding of beauty, love, religious experience, moral sentiment, aesthetic feeling, and so forth, can never proceed through scientific methods. (Briere 1956: 30)

The debate lasted more than one year. In addition to Liang Qichao, Liang Shuming (1893-1988) and Zhang Dungsun (1886-1962) sided with Chang, while Hu Shi, Chen Duxiu, Wu Zhihui and many others were in Ding’s camp. In the end, Ding’s “scientific” faction prevailed and paved the way for another wave of cultural reform, the so-called “Movement of Overall Westernization” (quanpan xihua) that sought a complete abandonment of traditional culture and a replacement of a backward, conservative way of life with a Westernized, modern way of life.

5. Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy

a. Yang Rensan and the Buddhist Renaissance

In the early 20th century, the Chinese Buddhist school of Weishi, founded by Xuanzang during the Tang dynasty, was revived by Yang Rensan (1837-1911) and Ouyang Jinwu (1871-1943). Yang has been called the “Father of Modern Buddhism” because of his establishment of the “Nanjing Inscription Place for Sutras” (Jinglin Yinkechu) in 1866, which greatly contributed to the maintenance of Buddhist literature and the education of young monks. Yang advanced the Dashengcixin Lun (Essays on Awakening the Faith in Mahayana Buddhism) as the key work for understanding the essence of Buddha’s teaching. This text promotes the doctrine of “One Mind Opens Two Ways” (yixin kai ermen), according to which “Two Ways” refers to the Way of Real Mind (xinzhenru men) or the category of reality, noumena, suchness, and so forth, and the Way of Passing Mind (xinshengmei men), or the category of appearance, phenomena, ephemerality, and so on. In Yang’s understanding, the doctrine of “One Mind Opens Two Ways” provides a full account of life and death, which is the basic concern of Buddhism. All Buddhist practices aim at helping people to achieve Buddhahood and freedom from suffering, conditioned existence in cyclical rebirth (samsara). For Yang, these aims are made possible because both one’s suffering and one’s redemption from suffering coexist in one’s mind. Once one discovers his immaculate nature, which is pure, pristine, changeless and irremovable, then he will achieve Buddhahood. However, if he is entangled by ignorance, greed, anger, wantonness, and evils, then he will continue to suffer from cyclical birth and death (although essentially these will not affect his immaculate nature). Thus in Yang’s view, the study of mind and consciousness (in the sense of activity-consciousness or yehshi) is of primal importance and can be best accomplished through this type of Buddhist discipline.

b. Ou-Yang Jingwu and the Chinese Academy of Buddhism

Yang’s idea deeply impressed his disciple Ouyang Jingwu, a forerunner of both modern Chinese Buddhism and Neo-Confucianism (whose leading figure, Xiong Shili [1885-1968], was a disciple of Ouyang). Ouyang originally was a Neo-Confucian familiar with Zhu Xi and Wang Yangming who eventually tired of the “empty talk” of Neo-Confucianism and became interested in Yang’s Weishi Buddhism. In 1922, carrying on Yang’s career of reprinting Buddhist literature and promoting Buddhist education, Ouyang founded the Chinese Academy of Buddhism (Zhina Neixueyuan) at Nanjing, which soon became the center for Weishi studies. Ouyang himself republished the most important classic of Weishi, the Yogacaryabhumi Sastra (Yoga Masters on the Spiritual Levels of Buddhist Practice or Yujiashidi Lun), with an introduction that was highly praised by the Buddhist academic community of the time. Before this, in 1921, he gave a lecture entitled “Buddhist Teaching is neither a Religion nor a Philosophy” at Nanjing Normal High School in which he distinguished Buddhism from both religion and philosophy. In Ouyang’s view, Buddhism does not teach the belief in the existence of God or gods, nor does it maintain any relations coalescing God and man, so it should not be regarded as a “religion” in the Western theistic sense. Again, the term “philosophy” does not apply to Buddhism either, as the former has no concern of the ultimate destiny of man and pays no attention to achieving the highest spiritual status through self-cultivation. Thus, Ouyang praised Buddhism as the all-encompassing learning that covers cosmology, epistemology, psychology, and the issue of life and death–as the only learning, in fact, that will help people to solve the problem of life and death.

Although a faithful follower of Yang, Ouyang did not accept all his master’s views without reservation. He differed from Yang in his understanding of the significance and adequacy of the Essays on Awakening the Faith in Mahayana Buddhism. Yang appreciated the work for its union of “reality” with “appearance” in one mind; Ouyang, however, criticized this doctrine severely according to the principle of “Distinguishing Substance from Function” (jianbie tiyong). Ouyang argued that “reality” or suchness indicates the substance and essence of a thing, whereas “appearance” or the sensible merely indicates the function or work of a thing. These two belong to different levels of category and should not be taken indiscriminately, as the Essays do. Ouyang then tried to go beyond Weishi, and studied Avatamsaka Sutra and Mahaparinirvana Sutra in his later years with the purpose of expanding and advancing modern Buddhist thought. With his effort, Chinese Buddhism flourished once again in the early 1920s and ’30s, and many celebrities such as Liang Qichao and Cai Yuanpei came to Ouyang’s help to sponsor the Chinese Academy of Buddhism. His thought has proven to be quite influential on subsequent Chinese Buddhist and Neo-Confucian thinkers, including Tai Xu (1890-1947), Lu Cheng (1896-1989), and the aforementioned Xiong Shili.

c. Liang Shuming and Neo-Confucianism

The Buddhist renaissance mentioned above may be regarded as the most insulated quarter of modern Chinese philosophy, insofar as it paid no attention to the prevalence of Western philosophy in China and maintained itself firmly on the traditional track. Modern Confucianism, however, pursued a combined course, partly following the traditional way and partly transforming itself in response to the challenge of Western culture. Among the traditional Confucianists, the late Qing reformer and mentor of Liang Qichao, Kang Yuwei (1858-1927), might be regarded as the last Confucian who was convinced that China could solve its problems by traditional learning alone. Even after the complete rejection of Confucianism by Hu Shi and Chen Duxiu in the early 1920s, Confucianism still retained its defenders. Most notable among these was Liang Shuming, who published Dongxiwenhua jichizhexue (The Oriental and Occidental Cultures and Their Philosophies) in 1922. In this book, Liang attempted a macro-scale analysis of Eastern and Western cultures and divided the development of world cultures into three different stages: (1) the objective, (2) the moderate, and (3) the divine, which correspond to three kinds of life attitude -- the outward, the inward, and the backward, respectively. According to Liang, modern European culture with its objective spirit should be ascribed to the first stage. People who live in this culture aim to understand and exploit nature in order to satisfy their mounting needs and desires, and therefore assume an outward life attitude, an attitude of aggression, striving, progression, and competition. In Liang’s view, Chinese culture could be ascribed to the second stage, as the Chinese knew quite well that excess desire for material goods undermines the true happiness of humankind. Without undergoing the first stage, Chinese culture came directly to the second stage and thus was in fact morally precocious, adopting an inward life attitude of moderation and pursuing the equilibrium of humanity and nature, a harmonization of reason and emotions. Finally, Liang saw Indian culture as representative of the last stage, in which high wisdom teaches people to abstain from desire and pleasure and make them assume a backward life attitude toward this sensual world. “In short,” Liang argued, “it is necessary to reject Indian culture as useless, to modify Western culture with true happiness in view, and to reassert the value of Chinese culture.” In Liang’s optimistic vision, “The world culture will eventually be the renovated Chinese culture.” Thus from a more or less spiritualistic outlook, Liang provided a different evaluation of Chinese traditional culture by offering a broader picture of the total developments of human civilization and its destiny, though without founding arguments.

d. Fung Yulan and Neo-Confucianism

The renowned scholar Fung Yulan (1895-1990), a contemporary of Liang, was another important figure in the camp of Confucian defense. Fung, like Hu, had also been a student of John Dewey, as he studied at Columbia University from 1919 to 1924 and received his Ph.D. there. He then returned to China, where he mainly taught at Qinghua University and edited a professional journal, Philosophical Critique (1927-1937), with Hu Shi, Carsun Chang, Zhang Dongsun, et al. In 1934, Fung published the first volume of his History of Chinese Philosophy, which was translated into English in 1937 and became the first book on this subject in English. From 1939 to 1947, Fung published a series of books under the title of Xinlixue (New Rational Philosophy) that made him the initiator of modern Neo-Confucian movement. Carrying on the traditions of Song and Ming Neo-Confucianism, Fung’s “New Rational Philosophy” was based on four concepts: principle (li), material force (qi), the substance of Dao or Way (daoti), and the Great Whole (daquan). Roughly speaking, Fung assumed a realist outlook and laid out the basic tenets of his philosophy as follows. First, everything exists as something really exists, and it is inherent within itself as a “principle” that makes it what it is. Second, everything exists by taking its shape from material force; since the “principle” is eternal, universal, and abstract, there must be something that is temporal, particular, and concrete to make a thing really exist. Third, whatever exists, exists in a flux. The totality of ephemeral phenomena and the transient world is called the substance of Dao. Fourth, the totality of whatever exists, the ultimate existence, is called the Great Whole. Borrowing the totalistic concept from Buddhism, Fung sees the Great Whole as an indication that, in the ultimate reality, “one is all and all is one.” In addition, The Great Whole is also the life-purpose of a philosopher who tries to understand the external world, to realize his potential abilities, and to serve Heaven: that is, to fulfill humanity. Thus, Fung was basically a Neo-Confucian of Zhu Xi’s type, who maintained that universal principles should be the foundations of a moral cosmos in which humanity can be fulfilled. This can be seen in Fung’s paper “Chinese Philosophy and a Future World Philosophy,” published in 1948 by The Philosophical Review, which makes comparisons between Plato and Zhu Xi, Immanuel Kant and the Daoists, and establishes human perfection as the major goal of Confucianism.

e. Carsun Chang and Neo-Confucianism

Though Fung was the first modern Chinese philosopher who carried on the traditions of Song and Ming Neo-Confucianism by elaborating its metaphysical systems, it was Carsun Chang who literally gave birth to the term “Neo-Confucianism” or Xinjujia and provided a great impetus to the later “New Confucian” movement in Hong Kong and Taiwan. As mentioned before, in the “Debate of 1923,” Chang allied himself with Liang Qichao and Liang Shuming in fighting against the torrents of anti-Confucianism and scientism. However, like Fung, Chang was acquainted with Western culture and studied abroad in Japan and Germany. In 1918, Chang studied with the German idealist Rudolf Eucken at Jena University. Despite his interest in philosophy, he threw himself into politics and founded a party which was at first called “National Socialist,” and then “Social Democrat.” In 1957, after immigrating to the United States, Chang returned to his past interests and wrote The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought, which gives a full account of Neo-Confucianism from the Tang thinker Han Yu (768-824) to the beginning of the early Republican period and freely associates Neo-Confucianism and Chan Buddhism with Western idealism and liberalism. The book was the first work on Neo-Confucianism in English and in it, Chang coined the term “Neo-Confucianism,” since widely used by academics in both the East and the West.

f. Xiong Shili and Neo-Confucianism

Another representative of modern Neo-Confucianism was Xiong Shili. Xiong was deeply influenced by Ouyang’s Buddhist thought, but rejected his teacher’s doctrine of “Distinguishing Substance from Function.” In 1944, he wrote Xinweishi lun (New Doctrine of Consciousness-Only) in which he attempted to synthesize Chan Buddhism with the idealism of Neo-Confucianism and to criticize the Consciousness-Only school. According to Xiong, reality is in perpetual transformation, consisting of unceasing “closing” and “opening” movements, with everything arising from these movements. The universe in its “closing” aspect is prone to integrate substantial things, and the outcome may be called “matter.” While in its opening aspect, the universe intends to maintain its own nature and be its own master, and the outcome may be called “mind.” This mind itself is one part of the “original mind,” which implies the activities of consciousness and will as well. Both “closing” and “opening” are the functions of the universe, but they are the manifestations of the substance of the universe, too. Thus, there should be no separation or distinction of “substance” from “function,” as the “Consciousness-Only” school taught. The “Consciousness-Only” school maintains that there are two different realms, namely, the realm of temporality or phenomena (the realm of alaya) and the realm of suchness or noumena. Taking alaya as the cause of the consciousness, consciousness becomes the effect of alaya. In Xiong’s view, all these separations are due to the misleading doctrine of “Distinguishing Substance from Function” and should be lifted according to the doctrine of “Substance as Function.” Here, the concepts of “closing” and “opening” seem to be adopted from the Book of Changes and become the cornerstones of Xiong’s cosmology. Thus, with a strong inclination to Wang Yangming’s idealism, Xiong made personal experience and self-awareness the only foundation of reality, which his critics maintained failed to do justice to the objective existence of the universe.

Xiong’s Neo-Confucian thought exercised great influence on his followers, especially Mou Zongsan (1909-1973) and Tang Junyi (1909-1978). After 1958, Mou and Tang taught at the the Chinese University of Hong Kong’s New Asia College and made Neo-Confucianism a popular school within modern Chinese philosophy.

g. Wang Kuowei and Classical Confucianism

Although Neo-Confucianism was predominant in modern Chinese philosophy, there was an unpopular strain of thought derived from the tradition of “classical Confucianism” of the early Qing that stood in opposition to Neo-Confucianism. The arguments between the two can be traced back to Wang Kuowei (1877-1927)’s critique of Zhang Zhidong’s denial of the value of philosophy. After its defeat in the Boxers’ Rebellion of 1900 by the Alliance of Eight Nations, the Qing government finally determined to implement its “New Policy” for constitutional and educational reforms. Zhang Zhidong was in charge of educational reform and assigned the office to stipulate the articles for the establishment of modern schools in China. As noted above, Zhang held a doctrine of “Chinese Learning as Substance and Western Learning as Function,” and contrived to preserve the dominant position of traditional learning. As a Neo-Confucian, Zhang took the Lixue of the Song as the authority of traditional learning and deemed Western philosophy to be poisonous, useless, and incompatible with Lixue, on the grounds that democratic theories in Western philosophy might spread dangerous ideas of freedom and human rights throughout China and result in unpredictable social upheavals. He then decided to eliminate “philosophy” from the undergraduate curriculum and replace it with “Neo-Confucianism.” Zhang’s decision was severely criticized by Wang Kuowei in his Zhexue Pienhuo (An Answer to the Doubt of Philosophy) (1903). Wang accused Zhang of espousing a narrow-minded, vulgar Confucian mode of thinking that attempted to grant a franchise to Neo-Confucianism in an era seeking for freedom of thought. He argued that philosophy should not be deemed poisonous or useless as it comprises broader scope than politics and jurisprudence that teaches the ideas of freedom and equality, and utility should never be taken as a standard to which philosophy has to meet. The function of philosophy is to answer the metaphysical impetus of human beings for truth, goodness and beauty, instead of the need for utility. Deeply impressed by the systematic and logical rigorousness of Western philosophy, Wang contended that Western philosophy was a necessary intellectual resource for scholars who wished to analyze and reinterpret Chinese philosophy. Again, the value of Confucianism can only be properly estimated after one has full knowledge and an overall understanding of all the teachings of Chinese and Western philosophy. Neo-Confucianism is but only one of the Confucian schools and Confucianism is but only one of the schools of Chinese philosophy alongside Daoism, Mohism, Legalism, and so forth. Thus, Wang saw no reason to make Neo-Confucianism the authority of traditional learning or to exclude the teaching of Western philosophy from universities. Accordingly, Wang suggested that scholars expand the scope of traditional learning and to go beyond Neo-Confucianism or even Confucianism.

It is worth noting that Wang Kuowei himself was the first Chinese scholar to introduce Western philosophy with better understanding and deeper insight than Yan Fu. Before he was thirty, Wang had already studied Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason and Schopenhauer’s The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, The World as Will and Representation, and On the Will in Nature through Japanese and English translations, and was deeply impressed by the two German philosophers. When dealing with the most abstruse European philosophy, Wang admitted that he could hardly understand Kant. It was through studying Schopenhauer’s criticism of Kant’s doctrine of “thing-in-itself” that Kant became apprehensible to him. Wang was also familiar with Thomas Hobbes, Francis Bacon, John Locke , David Hume, Jeremy Bentham, and other Western thinkers by studying Henry Sidgwick’s Outlines of the History of Ethics. One would not be going too far in saying that Wang was the first Chinese scholar with such a broad knowledge of Western philosophy. Nonetheless, after the age of thirty, Wang gave up the study of philosophy and turned to Chinese classics, history and literature, which made him eventually one of the greatest Chinese historians, archaeologists, and men of letters. The brilliant scholar ended his own life in the Kunming Lake of Yihe Royal Garden when he was only fifty years old.

h. Thome Fang and Classical Confucianism

Among the modern Chinese philosophers who flourished in the early 1930s, Thome Fang (1899-1977) was the true follower of Wang Kuowei. He shared Wang’s refutation of the narrowness of Neo-Confucianism and confirmed Wang’s assertion of the significance of philosophy. Like Wang, Fang had received a solid classical education as a result of his family upbringing, from which he developed a strong conviction of the preeminence of traditional Chinese culture. He also had a comprehensive knowledge of Western philosophy, having received his Ph.D. in philosophy from the University of Wisconsin at Madison in 1924. Fang was in fact the first Chinese scholar to introduce a number of Western writers, including ancient Greek tragedians and the philosophers George Santayana and Alfred North Whitehead, to Chinese readers. When he began his philosophical career in 1926 by teaching at the Central University of Nanjing, he published a series of papers on science, philosophy, and life. In these papers Fang gave high appraisal to Whitehead’s opposition to scientific materialism and agreed to Whitehead’s criticism of the fallacies of “bifurcation of nature” and “misplaced concreteness,” which are the presuppositions of scientific knowledge. Among the various Western philosophical strains, Fang found that Greek philosophy was the one closest to original Confucianism and saw Whitehead’s concept of nature as “creative advance” as parallel to the concept of “creativity” in the Book of Changes, whereas he regarded modern European philosophy as constantly trapped by all kinds of dualism and thus at variance with Chinese philosophy. In “Three Types of Philosophical Wisdom” (1938), Fang maintained that there are three types of philosophical wisdom, the ancient Greek, the modern European and the classic Chinese, which represent the most significant cultural aspects in the development of human history. In Fang’s account, the ancient Greeks praised reason and took reality to be the realm of the intelligible, the modern Europeans scrutinized nature and developed science and technology successfully, whereas the Chinese eulogized humanity and enshrined universal principles–Dao--in the highest place of their philosophical system. Thus for Fang the Greek speculative wisdom, the European technological wisdom and the Chinese moderate wisdom can be characterized by rationality, efficiency, and universal equity respectively. And if these three types of wisdom can be incorporated into a coherent whole, with one complementing to the others, so Fang imagined, the most desirable form of world culture would emerge.

In addition, according to Fang, Chinese wisdom is best represented by Confucius's interpretations of the Book of Changes, Laozi’s doctrine of Dao, and Mozi’s ideal of mutual love, which he saw as the most important elements of Chinese philosophy. In contrast, Fang rejected sectarian Daoism and Neo-Confucianism as decadent forms of original Daoism and Confucianism, insofar as sectarian Daoism is greatly involved with popular folk beliefs and yinyang theory and Neo-Confucianism transforms the cosmology of the Book of Changes into a kind of materialistic cosmogony. Even so, Fang was the first modern Chinese philosopher who recognized the philosophical significance of the Book of Changes, convening regular meetings with several scholars to explore and discuss the philosophical implications of this classic text from 1935 to 1937 in Nanjing and jointly publishing Yixue Taolunji (A Collection of Papers on the Book of Changes) (1937), the first work to study the Book of Changes in connection with Western philosophy, inspiring a new generation of Chinese scholars to approach the text in this way.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Briere, O. Fifty Years of Chinese Philosophy 1898-1950. Trans. Laurence G. Thompson. London: George Allen and Unwin, 1956.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought. New York: Bookman Associates, 1957.
  • Dubs, Homer H. “Recent Chinese Philosophy.” The Journal of Philosophy 35 (1938): 345-355. Fang, Thome. Chinese Philosophy: Its Spirit and Its Development. Taipei: Linking Publishing Co., Ltd., 1981.
  • Fung, Yu-lan, “Chinese Philosophy and a Future World Philosophy.” The Philosophical Review 57 (1948): 539-549.
  • Fung, Yu-lan. A Short History of Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Derk Bodde. New York: The Free Press, 1976.
  • Kwok, D.W.Y. Scientism in Chinese Thought, 1900-1950. New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 1965.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin I. In Search of Wealth and Power: Yen Fu and the West. Cambridge: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1964.
  • Shen, Vincent. “Creativity as Synthesis of Contrasting Wisdoms: An Interpretation of Chinese Philosophy in Taiwan since 1949.” Philosophy East and West A Quarterly of Comparative Philosophy 43 (1993): 179-287.
  • Sun, Yat-sen. The Three Principles of the People. Trans. Frank W. Price. Taipei: China Publishing Company, 1981.

Author Information

Yih-Hsien Yu
Tunghai University

Zhong Hui (Chung Hui, 225–264 C.E.)

Zhong Hui (Chung Hui) was a major philosophical figure during China’s early medieval period (220-589 CE). An accomplished interpreter of the Laozi and the Yijing, Zhong Hui contributed significantly to the early development of xuanxue—literally “learning” (xue) of the “dark” or “mysterious” (xuan) Dao (“Way”), but sometimes translated as “Neo-Daoism". He also was a major political figure whose ambition eventually led to his untimely demise. Virtually all of Zhong Hui’s writings have been lost, which perhaps explains why he has been given scant attention by students of Chinese philosophy. Had he not failed in his attempt to overthrow the regime of his day, no doubt his writings would have been preserved and given the attention they justly deserve. In particular, his views on human “capacity and nature” (caixing), as developed in his interpretation of the Laozi, are major contributions to xuanxue philosophy, which dominated the Chinese intellectual scene from the third to the sixth century CE. In contrast to other thinkers of the time, who argued that capacity and nature are the same (tong), different (yi), or diverge from one another (li), Zhong Hui argued that they coincide (he). In effect, he proposed that what is endowed is potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to completion through learning and effort. While one’s native endowment is not sufficient, one must have some material to begin with in order to achieve the desired result. Thus, it cannot be said that the latter has nothing to do with the former.

Table of  Contents

  1. Philosopher and Statesman
  2. Zhong Hui’s Laozi Learning
    1. The “Nothingness” of Dao
    2. Self-Cultivation, Great Peace, and the Nature of the Sage
  3. The Debate on Capacity and Nature
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Philosopher and Statesman

Toward the end of the second century CE, the once glorious Han dynasty (founded in 206 BCE) was already in irreparable decline, with regional military commanders competing for power and control. Among them, Cao Cao (155–220) proved the strongest and in 220 CE his son, Cao Pi (187–226), formally ended the rule of Han and established the Wei dynasty (220–265).

The third century was a time of profound change. The end of the Han dynasty brought political turmoil and hardship; but it also cleared a space for intellectual renewal. The Confucian tradition that dominated much of the Han intellectual landscape now seemed powerless to overcome the forces of disorder that threatened to tear the country asunder. Indeed, to some scholars Han Confucianism was not only ineffective as a remedy, but also part of the problem that led to the downfall of the Han dynasty. New approaches to reestablishing order were urgently needed. In this context, xuanxue was born.

The word xuan literally depicts a shade of black with dark red. It appears prominently in the Laozi, signifying metaphorically the profound unfathomability of the Dao. For this reason, xuanxue has been translated as “Neo-Daoism.” However, while it is true that third-century Chinese philosophers turned to the Laozi for insight, the term “Neo-Daoism” can be misleading because mainstream xuanxue was never a partisan Daoist or “anti-Confucian” movement. Rather, xuanxue scholars saw the whole classical heritage as embodying the truth of the Dao. In other words, Confucius, Laozi, and other sages and near-sages of old were all concerned with unlocking the mystery of Dao, to lay out a blueprint for order. They were all “Daoists” in this sense. What seemed necessary was a radical reinterpretation of the classical tradition that would eradicate the distortions and excesses of Han Confucianism and reestablish the rule of Dao, in both practice and theory, in government and learning. To avoid misunderstanding, most scholars today prefer to translate xuanxue as “Dark Learning,” or more clumsily but less ambiguous, “Learning of the Mysterious (Dao).”

Although the Wei dynasty had to contend with two rival kingdoms during its early years, there was a sense of optimism that order could be restored. There were eager attempts to reform public administration, especially the process of appointment of officials, and law. During the Zhengshi reign period (240–249) of the Wei dynasty in particular, there was a flurry of intellectual activities that saw the first wave of xuanxue scholars arriving on the scene. Zhong Hui was a significant player in this development.

Zhong Hui hailed from a distinguished family, politically influential and known especially for its expertise in law. His father, Zhong You (d. 230), was one of the most powerful statesmen in the early Wei regime and a noted calligrapher and Yijing expert as well. From the start, Zhong Hui was groomed to follow in his father’s footsteps. Zhong Hui himself recounts that he began his formal education under the guidance of his mother with the Xiaojing (Classic of Filial Piety) at the age of three. He then studied the Analects, Shijing (Classic of Poetry), Shujing (Book of Documents), the Yijing (with his father’s commentary), and other classics before he was sent to the imperial academy to further his studies at the age of fourteen. The Zhong family evidently held a special interest in the Yijing and the Laozi. Zhong You had written on both, and Zhong Hui’s mother was also a dedicated student of the Laozi and the Yijing.

As Zhong Hui’s biography in the Sanguozhi (History of the Three Kingdoms) relates, he began his official career as an assistant in the palace library during the Zhengshi era. Reputed for his wide learning and skill in disputation, he was soon promoted to serve as a deputy secretary at the Central Secretariat. At that time, Cao Shuang (d. 249) controlled the Wei court. On the intellectual front, many looked to He Yan (d. 249) as their leader. Zhong Hui was then part of this elite circle. He and Wang Bi (226–249), in particular, were singled out as among the brightest and most promising of their generation. (Wang Bi, of course, now occupies a hallowed place in the history of Chinese philosophy as a brilliant interpreter of the Laozi and the Yijing.)

The scene took a sudden change in 249 when Sima Yi (179–251) successfully staged a coup that led to the death of Cao Shuang, He Yan, and other members of their faction. After Sima Yi’s death, control of the Wei government came into the hands of his two sons, Sima Shi (208–255) and Sima Zhao (211–265). In 265, the latter’s son, Sima Yan, (236–290) formally ended the reign of Wei and established the Jin dynasty (265–420).

The fall of Cao Shuang and He Yan in 249 marked a turning point in Wei politics. Zhong Hui managed to keep out of harm’s way despite his apparent association with the Cao faction. After 249, Zhong Hui was able to retain his post at the Central Secretariat and soon became a key member of the Sima regime. Rising from Palace Attendant to Metropolitan Commandant, and to General of the Suppression of the West in 262, Zhong Hui achieved remarkable success in the political arena. In 263, in recognition of his role in the conquest of the rival kingdom of Shu, he was made Chief Minister of Culture and Instruction, one of the “Three Excellencies” of state. At the height of his power, Zhong Hui considered his achievement to be unsurpassed in the world and that he could no longer serve under anyone. Calculating that he had control of a formidable army and that he could at least claim the land of Shu even if he failed to conquer the entire country, Zhong Hui decided to turn against the Sima government. He was killed by his own troops in the first month of 264.

2. Zhong Hui’s Laozi Learning

Few of Zhong Hui’s writings have survived. A Zhong Hui ji (Collected Works) in nine scrolls has been reported, but it is no longer extant. He was also an accomplished poet; a few fragments of his poetry in the fu (prose-poem) style have been preserved in various sources. Zhong Hui seems to have written two essays on the Yijing, although little of his Yijing learning can now be reconstructed. He was the author of a commentary on the Laozi. He also contributed significantly to a debate on the relationship between “capacity and nature” (caixing).

In early medieval China, caixing was one of the basic topics about which every intellectual was expected to be able to say something. Fu Jia (also pronounced Fu Gu, 209–255), who criticized He Yan during the Zhengshi era and later acted as a major policy maker in the Sima administration, is generally acknowledged to be the leading figure in this debate. Zhong Hui, who became a junior associate of Fu Jia after 249, is said to have “collected and discussed” the latter’s deliberation on the “identity and difference of capacity and nature.” Zhong’s work presents four views on the subject, including his own, and is given the title Caixing siben lun (On the Four Roots of Capacity and Nature). Despite its evident popularity in Wei-Jin China, other than the general position of the four views and the individuals who hold them, which will be introduced later, we have no further knowledge of this work.

According to Du Guangting (850–933), He Yan, Wang Bi, and Zhong Hui all attempted in their interpretation of the Laozi to make clear “the way of ultimate emptiness and nonaction, and of governing the family and the country.” Unfortunately, Zhong Hui’s Laozi commentary has been lost, probably since the end of the Song dynasty (960-1279). Today, we can only see glimpses of Zhong’s Laozi learning through about 25 quotations from his commentary preserved in a number of sources.

When xuanxue became an established trend during the Jin dynasty, its supporters looked back to the Zhengshi period rather nostalgically as the “golden age” of philosophical debate and criticism. The concept of wu—variously translated as “nothing,” “nothingness,” “nonbeing” or “negativity”—is often singled out as the key to this new learning. As the Jin scholar Wang Yan (256–311) puts it, “During the Zhengshi period, He Yan, Wang Bi, and others propounded the teachings of Laozi and Zhuangzi. They established the view that heaven and earth and the myriad things are all rooted in wu.” Zhong Hui was among the “others” who sought to reformulate classical learning by focusing on the mysterious Dao, on the basis of which government and society may be restructured to establish lasting peace and order. What must be emphasized is that xuanxue is not monolithic. The concept of wu generates a new focus, but it is subject to interpretation, with different ethical and political implications.

a. The “Nothingness” of Dao

The concept of wu fundamentally serves to bring out the mystery of Dao, which is “nameless” and “formless,” according to the Laozi, and as such transcends language and sensory perception. As Zhong Hui understands it, the Dao is “shadowy, dark, dim, and obscure; it is therefore described as xuan” (commentary to Laozi 1). The Dao is also described as “silent and void” in the Laozi. This means, Zhong explains, that it is “empty and without substance” (comm. to Laozi 25).

Though formless and nameless, dark and mysterious, the Dao is nonetheless said to be the “beginning” and “mother” of all things (e.g., Laozi 1 and 42). Indeed, according to the Laozi, “All things under heaven are born of you (something); you is born of wu (nothing)” (ch. 40). This obviously requires explanation.

Life is essentially constituted by “vital energy” (qi). This can be regarded as the generally accepted view in traditional China. Applied to the Laozi, this suggests that the Dao should be understood as the source of the essential qi that generated the yin and yang energies at the “beginning.” Through a process of further differentiation, the created order then came into being. As the origin of the vital energy or cosmic “pneuma” that makes life possible, the Dao is indeed formless and nameless, and for this reason may be described as “nothing” (wu), in the sense of not having any characteristics of things. But, wu does not connote metaphysical “nonbeing,” “negativity,” or absence. Zhong Hui shares this view. In contrast, Wang Bi emphasizes in his commentary on the Laozi that the multiplicity of beings logically demands a prior ontological unity. From this perspective, “Dao” does not refer to a kind of primordial, undifferentiated substance, formless and of which nothing can be said; rather, it signifies the necessary ground of being.

According to the Laozi, “Heaven models after the Dao. The Dao models after what is naturally so (ziran)” (ch. 25). According to Zhong Hui, the reason the Dao is described as ziran is that “no one knows whence it comes.” Moreover, the Laozi observes, “The great image does not have any form” (ch. 41). The context suggests that the “great image” is a metaphor for the Dao, and this is how Zhong Hui has understood it: “There is no image that does not respond to it; this is what is called the ‘great image’. Since it does not have any bodily shape, how can it have any form or appearance?” In these instances, the mystery of Dao has little to do with “nonbeing” as an abstract concept, but rather intimates the ever-existing and formless nature of the generative force that brought forth heaven and earth and the myriad beings.

The Dao is also called the “One,” as Zhong Hui interprets the Laozi. It is “ceaseless, indeed, yet it does not have any ties; overflowing, yet it does not become diminished. Subtle and wondrous, it is difficult to name it. In the end, it returns to a state of not being anything (with discernible characteristics)” (comm. to Laozi 14; cf. comm. to Laozi 39). Limitless and ultimately unfathomable, the Dao is indeed “subtle and wondrous” and therefore “difficult to name,” but it is a real presence. The Laozi states that the Dao “stands on its own and does not change.” Zhong Hui explains, “Solitary, without a mate, it is therefore said to be ‘standing on its own’. From antiquity to the present, it is always one and the same; thus it is stated, it ‘does not change’” (comm. to Laozi 25). Further, the Laozi specifically points out that the Dao “operates everywhere and is free from danger” (ch. 25). Zhong Hui’s commentary here reads: “There is no place that the Dao is not present; it is (thus) described as ‘operating everywhere’. Where it is present, it penetrates everything; thus it is without danger.”

For Zhong Hui, the concept of Dao thus explains from a cosmological perspective the genesis of being and the emergence of order in the cosmos. The Laozi may seem to privilege the concept of wu, to bring out the indefinable fullness of the Dao, over the concept of you, which subsumes under it the world of things, but in the final analysis the two are interdependent in enabling the proper functioning of the universe. Finding an apt illustration in a common mode of transportation in early China, the Laozi thus announces in chapter 11 that “thirty spokes” join into one hub; but the use or function of the wheel, and by extension the carriage or cart as a whole, is not so much dependent on the solid spokes as the empty space within the hub. Similarly, clay may be shaped and treated to make vessels, and doors and windows cut out to make a room; but it is the “emptiness” of the vessel or room that makes possible its use or function. “Therefore,” the Laozi concludes, “having something (you) is what produces benefit, (but) having nothing (wu) is what produces use.”

To Zhong Hui, the Laozi makes use of these metaphors “to bring to light that you and wu gain from each other, and neither can be neglected …. Wu depends on you to become of benefit; you relies on wu to be of use.” The relationship between wu and you may be likened to that between “interiority” (nei) and “externality” (wai)—concrete objects are able to function and generate value externally because of their inner capacity endowed by the Dao in the form of vital energies. The interdependence of you and wu represents an intrinsic “law” in a Dao-centered universe (comm. to Laozi 11). This has important ethical implications.

b. Self-Cultivation, Great Peace, and the Nature of the Sage

Derived from the Dao, the world reflects a pristine order. In the ideal Dao-centered world, filial love and respect, for example, would be entirely spontaneous and thus unremarkable, which is why the Laozi regards “filial piety” in the Confucian sense as a virtue that merits praise and has to be perfected if not acquired as having arisen only after the decline of the Dao (Laozi 18). Deliberate effort at bringing love and respect into the world, in other words, proves necessary only after natural filial affection has been lost. Thus Zhong Hui writes, “If the nine generations of the family are all in accord, then love and respect will have no cause to be applied. ‘When the six relations are not in harmony’ [as the Laozi phrases it], then filial piety and compassion will become conspicuous.” The concept of “naturalness” (ziran), in this sense, involves not only the regularity of natural processes and the plenitude of nature but also a perceived “natural” harmony and order in the social arena.

The pristine Dao-derived order has been lost. The aim of xuanxue is to restore this order. For Zhong Hui, the process of recovery begins with self-cultivation, which requires careful tending of one’s qi-energy. According to Zhong Hui, “the soul manages and protects its form and qi, so as to enable it to last long.” This is why the Laozi urges the people to “look after the soul and embrace the One” (comm. to Laozi 10).

Aligned with the yin-yang, cosmological theory, the idea that human beings are constituted spiritually and physically by qi was well established by the third century. No bifurcation of “soul” and “body” is implied. Both are constituted by qi, although the “qi of the blood” may be less “pure” when compared with the more subtle qi of the soul or spirit. In this context, self-cultivation involves both nourishing and purifying the vital qi-energy.

Chapter 12 of the Laozi warns that the “five colors cause one’s eyes to become blind,” and of the other harmful effects that stem from indulging in one’s senses. The Laozi concludes: “For this reason the sage is for the belly and not for the eyes.” Emphasizing the importance of self-cultivation, Zhong Hui relates this to the being of the ideal sage: “The genuine vital energy pervades (the sage’s) inner being; thus it is said, (he is) ‘for the belly’. Externally, desires have been eliminated; thus, it is said, ‘not for the eyes’.”

Here, the complementarity of the “inner” and the “outer” again guides Zhong Hui’s interpretation. The sage is always mindful of his qi-nature in everything he does and certainly does not live to satisfy the senses. On the opening sentence of Laozi 16—“Attain utmost emptiness; maintain complete tranquility”—Zhong Hui again stresses this point: “… eliminate emotions and worries to reach the ultimate of emptiness. The mind is always quiet, so as to maintain complete tranquility.”

Self-cultivation translates into certain effects or ways of doing things at both the personal and political levels. The Laozi states: “The yielding and weak will overcome the hard and strong” (ch. 36). In this same chapter, the Laozi elaborates, “If you would have a thing shrink, stretch it first.” Zhong Hui comments: “If one wishes to control the hard and strong, one assumes the appearance of being submissive and weak. Stretch it first; shrink it afterward—win or lose, (the outcome) is certain.” In chapter 22, the Laozi brings out the central Daoist insight that preservation or fulfillment does not lie in self-aggrandizement or aggressive action but in self-effacement and non-contention, in embracing humility and the way of “yieldingness.” “If one is truly able to keep being yielding,” Zhong Hui reasons, then “everything will certainly return to him”—that is to say, all successes and benefits will as a matter of course belong to him. In the ideal Dao-centered world, this would describe the being of the sage-ruler, who abides by naturalness, acts with “nonaction” (wuwei) in the sense of yieldingness, and whose inner tranquility would ensure the absence of selfish desire and the flourishing of the realm.

The sage is someone who possesses “superior virtue,” as the Laozi describes it. Zhong Hui explains: “(He who) embodies the wondrous and subtle spirit to preserve the transformations (of nature) is (the man of) superior virtue” (comm. to Laozi 38). In the government of the sage, penal laws and punishment do not apply, for the sage is able to transform the people through nonaction, guiding them to regain their natural simplicity (comm. to Laozi 19). This is the reign of “great peace” (taiping) as envisaged by the majority of xuanxue scholars, in which virtues would naturally abound and family relations would be in complete harmony. Can great peace be attained? There is no question that a sage can realize the taiping ideal; but is it the case that sages alone can bring about great peace? Can it not be realized by worthy and able rulers and ministers, who are committed to the way of the sage but are not sages? Zhong Hui could not but be concerned with this question, which began to surface during the Han period and continued to attract debate during the early years of the Wei dynasty. In fact, Zhong Hui’s father, Zhong You, asserts unequivocally that sages are necessary for the realization of great peace.

The role of the sage in realizing great peace presupposes a prior understanding of the nature of the sage. Is “sagehood” inborn, or can it be acquired through effort? This was a major topic of discussion also among the Wei elite. The prevalent view in early xuanxue seems to be that sages are born, not made, a view to which Zhong Hui subscribes and which stems directly from a cosmological understanding of the Dao, particularly the deciding role of qi in shaping the nature and destiny of human beings.

In a cosmological interpretation, the Dao informs all beings, provides them with a “share” of its potent energy, which accounts for their lifespan, capacity, and all other aspects of their being. Sages are exceptional beings, whose qi-endowment is extraordinarily pure and abundant. On this basis, He Yan, for example, thus argues that “sages do not have emotions,” which attracted a substantial following during the Zhengshi period. Zhong Hui was drawn to He Yan’s view and is said to have developed it in his own thinking. As the Sanguozhi relates, “He Yan maintained that the sage does not have pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy. His views were extremely cogent, on which Zhong Hui and others elaborated.”

Emotions are “impure” qi-agitations that disturb the mind and render impossible the work of sagely government. The sage, blessed with the finest and richest energy that arises from the “One,” is free from such qi-imperfections, which enables him to be absolutely impartial and to realize great peace not only within himself but also in government. The sage, in other words, is utterly different from ordinary human beings. On this view, this is a basic difference in qi-constitution, which amounts to a difference in kind and not in degree. “Sagehood,” in other words, should be understood in terms of a sage nature that is inborn and not an accomplished goal that is attainable through learning and effort.

If Zhong Hui is of the view that sage nature is inborn, why does he emphasize self-cultivation to fortify the qi within and to eliminate desires? As we have seen also, Zhong Hui affirms that the “soul,” if properly managed and protected, can “last long.” Does this show that he believes in the existence of “immortals” (xian) and that it is possible to attain immortality? In a fu poem on the chrysanthemum (Juhuafu), Zhong Hui writes, “Thus, the chrysanthemum … [if ingested] flows within and renders the body light; it is the food of immortals.” Further, in the same poem, Zhong rhapsodizes, “Those who ingest it would live long, and those who consume it would find their spirit unobstructed.” Zhong Hui has also written a fu on grapes (Putaofu), in which he describes the fruit as “having embodied the finest qi in nature.”

It is not surprising that Zhong Hui accepts the existence of immortals, which was a widely held belief at that time. Whether it is an immortal or a sage, the same reasoning applies. Only a select few are endowed at birth with the necessary qi-condition to develop into a sage or immortal. An ordinary human being cannot learn to become a sage, who is a different kind of being, but self-cultivation remains important because it is possible to nourish and purify one’s qi-endowment by means of certain substances and practices. In other words, although complete “transcendence” may be beyond reach, one can remove obstacles to personal fulfillment, prevent corruption of one’s nature, and ensure that one’s capacity is developed to the fullest.

The idea that only sages can realize great peace is grounded in this conception of the nature of the sage. If one believes, as Zhong Hui does, that the sage is of a special breed, absolutely pure and without cognitive-affective qi-disturbances, it would not make much sense to say that even those who are not sages could realize the reign of great peace. The uniqueness of the sage would then be inconsequential. Zhong Hui would thus agree with his father that great peace is an ideal realizable only by sages. Opposed to this is the view that it is possible to attain great peace even without the intervention of sages. What is crucial is that we learn from the ancient sages. If able and worthy individuals such as Yi Yin of the Shang dynasty and Yan Yuan (Yan Hui), the exemplary disciple of Confucius, were entrusted with governing the country, and if their policies would continue for several generations, then great peace may be realized.

From this latter perspective, the difference between a sage such as Confucius and worthies such as Yan Yuan is a matter of degree. Moreover, this implies that we can learn from the sages and worthies, which signals a particular Confucian approach to government and education. Benevolent government requires men of integrity and talent to serve the public good. Education is necessary to transmit the teaching of the sages and to lay a strong moral foundation. Care and compassion are required in the administration of justice. Step by step, with rulers and ministers serving as examples, the transformative power of Confucian virtues would instill benevolence and propriety in the hearts of the people or at least render them willing and obedient subjects. In this way, lasting order and peace may be secured.

Both camps considered Confucius to be the ideal sage. But whereas to some, Confucius was a great teacher, to others he embodied the best of heaven and earth. It would be impossible to be like Confucius in every respect, according to the latter; the assertion that great peace could be realized by able and worthy men would undermine the supra-mundane status of Confucius, who was such an exalted figure as to exclude the possibility of someone else matching his attainment. The sage is fundamentally different from “mere” mortals, and the sage alone can realize lasting peace. This implies a certain distrust of the nature and capacity of the people, who are driven by desires. It is important thus to curb one’s desires and to maintain tranquility. But this, too, can only be achieved by a few. For the majority, laws and models are necessary. They serve as the “outer” instruments that would complement the call to embrace “emptiness” within.

The concept of “law” (fa) is not limited to criminal justice. It concerns proper rulership and sociopolitical order at large. The principles of government must be clearly delineated for the rule of law to apply. In particular, the various duties and functions of officials must be carefully defined, so that there is accountability and quality control. Precisely because great peace can be realized only by sages, and given that sages are rare, government should depend on laws and processes, as opposed to individuals, so that official positions and duties would be occupied and performed by the right persons, laws and punishment would be appropriate, and in all aspects the “inner” and the “outer” would attain their proper balance.

3. The Debate on Capacity and Nature

Although the evidence at our disposal is limited, a consistent approach emerges from the surviving fragments of Zhong Hui’s Laozi commentary. Guided by a hermeneutic that equates the nothingness of Dao with the fullness of qi, Zhong Hui probes the basis of personal well-being and sociopolitical order. The pristine order of the Dao is characterized by intrinsic laws and standards, which ensure the smooth functioning of the cosmos and the integrity of sociopolitical institutions. Order would flourish in this ideal world, and remedial action would be superfluous. In a world where the Dao has declined, only a true sage can realize genuine order and peace. In the absence of a sage-ruler, due process is required to ensure sound governance, social stability and that justice prevails. In the context of early Wei politics, the system of official appointment would be of particular concern to those who seek to reestablish the rule of Dao.

In this context, the debate on capacity and nature may be understood. Zhong Hui is particularly noted for his contribution to this debate, which involves four positions—namely, that capacity and nature are the same (tong); that they are different (yi); that they coincide (he); and that they diverge from each other (li).

Fu Jia apparently initiated the debate by arguing for the first position. The second is represented by Li Feng (d. 254), who was Director of the Central Secretariat and whom Fu Jia denounced as pretentious and false. Zhong Hui held the third view, and Wang Guang (d. 251), who like Zhong Hui was a junior officer during the Zhengshi period, argued for the last position. Zhong Hui’s treatise, however, was no longer available by the early sixth century.

It has been suggested that the debate should be understood in terms of the political struggles between the Cao faction and the Sima faction during the Zhengshi period. Whereas Fu Jia and Zhong Hui (before his attempted revolt) sided with the Sima regime, both Li Feng and Wang Guang were struck down by it. This is an important observation. However, philosophically, what does it mean to say that capacity and nature are the same? In what sense can they be said to “coincide”?

The first position seems relatively straightforward in the light of the concept of qi. Inborn nature can be understood in terms of one’s innate capacity, which encompasses one’s physical, intellectual, moral, psychological, and spiritual endowments. In Fu Jia’s account, both capacity and nature are seen to be determined by qi-endowment. Whereas nature is the inner substance, capacity reaches outward and translates into ability as well as moral conduct. This view finds eloquent support in the Caixing lun (Treatise on Capacity and Nature) by another third-century scholar, Yuan Zhun. All beings that exist in heaven and earth, according to Yuan, can be either excellent or of a bad quality. Whereas the former is endowed with a “pure qi,” the latter is constituted by a “turbid energy.” It is like a piece of wood, Yuan adds: whether it is crooked or straight is a matter of nature, on the basis of which it has a certain capacity that can be made to serve particular ends. The same is true for human beings, who may be “worthy” or “unworthy” by nature. To argue that nature and capacity are the same, Fu Jia cannot but maintain also that sagacity is inborn.

Li Feng counters that capacity and nature are different. Fu Jia had misconstrued the relationship between capacity and nature, because whereas nature may be inborn, capacity is shaped by learning. This suggests that any accomplishment, moral or political, is ultimately dependent on effort. Fu Jia is evidently committed to affirming that a person may be born good or bad, strong or weak, bright or dull, depending on his or her qi-endowment. Li Feng’s counterview, however, proceeds on the premise that nature is “neutral” or unmarked, morally and in all other respects. What is endowed at birth is simply the biological apparatus to grow and to learn, but the person one becomes is a matter of learning and putting into practice the teachings of the sages. Yu Huan, a third-century historian, provides a helpful analogy: the effect of learning on a person is like adding color to a piece of plain silk. This should align with the view that sagehood can be achieved through effort and that sages are not necessary to realizing great peace, given the perceived transformative power of learning.

Zhong Hui’s position may be seen as an attempt to mediate between these two opposing views. Given Zhong Hui’s understanding of qi and the nature of the sage, he would obviously side with Fu Jia in this debate. Yet, the “identity” thesis seems to assume that what is endowed is both necessary and sufficient. Although native endowment is necessary for realized capacity, Zhong Hui is saying, it is not sufficient. Thus, when capacity is said to “coincide” with nature, Zhong Hui is in effect proposing that what is endowed is potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to completion. For immortals and sages, who are different in kind because of their exceptional qi-endowment, what is inner in the sense of innate capacity naturally manifests itself completely in extraordinary achievements. For ordinary human beings, however, nature does not amount to actual ability but only furnishes certain dispositions or directions of development. To be sure, if the native endowment is extremely poor, there is not much that can be done. Nevertheless, the real challenge to the identity thesis is that an excellent endowment may go to waste because the person succumbs to desire and would not learn. The inner provides the capital, but it requires external control to maintain its value, to generate profit, and to bring the investment to a successful close.

In response to Li Feng’s critique of Fu Jia, Zhong Hui thus offers a modified identity thesis that takes into account the place of learning and effort. Although having the “right stuff,” as it were, is not sufficient, one must have some material to begin with in order to achieve the desired result. Thus, it cannot be said that the latter has nothing to do with the former. In this context, Wang Guang adds a fourth view, which is stronger than Li Feng’s and appears to be directed especially against Zhong Hui’s position. Inborn nature does not provide the necessary fertile ground for cultivation; rather, it needs to be rectified by learning. Human beings are naturally driven by desire and therefore must rely on rituals and instruction to become responsible individuals. In this sense, capacity and nature do not “coincide” but “diverge” from each other.

The debate on caixing demonstrates the richness and complexity of xuanxue. The debate may have particular political relevance, but it presupposes an understanding of the origin and structure of the cosmos, the role of self-cultivation, the rule of law, the nature of the sage, and other issues central to Wei-Jin thought. The four views engage one another in coming to terms with the basis of goodness and other forms of excellence. Zhong Hui’s view on capacity and nature is consistent with his interpretation of the Laozi, both of which should be recognized as a major contribution to xuanxue philosophy. Had he not attempted to topple the Sima regime, or more precisely had he not failed in that attempt, no doubt his writings would have been preserved and given the attention they justly deserve.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Berkowitz, Alan J. Patterns of Disengagement: the Practice and Portrayal of Reclusion in Early Medieval China. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000.
  • Cai, Zong-qi, ed. Chinese Aesthetics: The Ordering of Literature, the Arts, and the Universe in the Six Dynasties. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2004.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. Two Visions of the Way. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. “The Essential Meaning of the Way and Virtue: Yan Zun and ‘Laozi Learning’ in Early Han China.” Monumenta Serica 46 (1998): 105–127.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. “The Daodejing and Its Tradition.” In Daoism Handbook, ed. Livia Kohn (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 2000), 1–29.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. “Zhong Hui’s Laozi Commentary and the Debate on Capacity and Nature in Third-Century China.” Early China 28 (2003): 101–159.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. “What are the ‘Four Roots of Capacity and Nature?” In Wisdom in China and the West, eds. Vincent Shen and Willard Oxtoby (Washington: Council for Research in Values and Philosophy, 2004), 143–184.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, trans. The Way of Lao Tzu. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1963.
  • Henricks, Robert. Philosophy and Argumentation in Third Century China: The Essays by Hsi K’ang. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983.
  • Holzman, Donald. Poetry and Politics: The Life and Works of Juan Chi (210-263). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1976.
  • Holzman, Donald. La vie et la pensée de Hi Kang (223-262 AP. J.-C.). Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1957.
  • Knechtges, David R., trans. Wen xuan, or Selections of Refined Literature. 3 vols. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1982–1996.
  • Kohn, Livia. Early Chinese Mysticism: Philosophy and Soteriology in the Taoist Tradition. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Lynn, Richard J., trans. The Classic of Changes: A New Translation of the I Ching as Interpreted by Wang Bi. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
  • Lynn, Richard J., trans. The Classic of the Way and Virtue: A New Translation of the Tao-te ching of Laozi as Interpreted by Wang Bi. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999.
  • Mather, Richard B. “The Controversy over Conformity and Naturalness during the Six Dynasties.” History of Religions 9 (1969–70): 160–180.
  • Mather, Richard B., trans. Shih-shuo Hsin-yü: A New Account of Tales of the World, by Liu I-ch'ing. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1976.
  • Robinet, Isabelle. Les commentaires du Tao to king jusqu'au VIIe siècle. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1977.
  • Shih, Vincent Y. C., trans. The Literary Mind and the Carving of Dragons. Hong Kong: Chinese University Press, 1983.
  • Shryock, J. K., trans. The Study of Human Abilities: The Jen Wu Chih of Liu Shao. American Oriental Series, vol. 11. New Haven: American Oriental Society, 1937; reprint, New York, 1966.
  • Tang, Yongtong. “Wang Bi’s New Interpretation of the I Ching and the Lun-yü.” Trans.Walter Liebenthal. Harvard Journal of Asiatic Studies 10 (1947): 124–161.
  • Wagner, Rudolf G. The Craft of a Chinese Commentator: Wang Bi on the Laozi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Wagner, Rudolf G. Language, Ontology, and Political Philosophy in China: Wang Bi’s Scholarly Exploration of the Dark (Xuanxue). Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Wagner, Rudolf G., trans. A Chinese Reading of the Daodejing: Wang Bi’s Commentary on the Laozi with Critical Text and Translation. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Yates, Robin D. S., trans. Five Lost Classics: Tao, Huanglao, and Yin-Yang in Han China. New York: Ballantine Books, 1997.
  • Yü, Ying-shih. “Individualism and the Neo-Taoist Movement in Wei-Chin China.” In Individualism and Holism: Studies in Confucian and Taoist Values, ed. Donald J. Munro (Ann Arbor: Center for Chinese Studies, University of Michigan, 1985), 121–155.
  • Ziporyn, Brook. The Penumbra Unbound: the Neo-Taoist Philosophy of Guo Xiang. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.

Author Information

Alan Kam-Leung Chan
National University of Singapore

Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130—1200)

Zhu_xiA preeminent scholar, classicist and a first-rate analytic and synthetic thinker, Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi) created the supreme synthesis of Song-Ming dynasty (960-1628 CE) Neo-Confucianism. Moreover, by selecting the essential classical Confucian texts--the Analects (Lunyu) of Confucius, the Book of Mencius (Mengzi, the Great Learning (Daxue) and the Doctrine of the Mean (Zhongyong)—then editing and compiling them, with commentary, as the Four Books (Sishu). In doing so, Zhu redefined the Confucian tradition and outlook. He restored its original focus on moral cultivation and realization from the more bureaucratic stance of Confucians of the preceding Han and Tang dynasty (206 BCE-905 CE) who concentrated on the Five Classics (Wujing) of classical antiquity. The Four Books became required reading for the imperial examination system from the Yuan dynasty (1280-1341) until the system was abolished near the end of the Qing dynasty (1644-1911) in 1908. In his philosophical work, Zhu fused the concepts of the principal Northern Song (960-1126 CE) thinkers, Shao Yong (1011-77), Zhou Dunyi (1017-73), Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-77) and the brothers Cheng Yi (1033-1107) and Cheng Hao (1032-85) into a rich, grand synthesis. Zhu Xi's thought has been the starting point for intellectual discourse and the focus of disputation for the last 800 years. His influence spread to Korea and Japan, which adopted Confucianism and the imperial examination system and were enamored of Zhu's intellectual achievements. To study traditional Chinese philosophy, especially Confucian thought, one must engage the ideas and works of Zhu Xi.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Philosophy of Human Nature and Approach to Self-Cultivation
  3. Moral Cosmic Synthesis
  4. Metaphysical Synthesis
  5. Key Interpreters of Zhu Xi
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Zhu Xi was born in Youqi in Fujian province, China in 1130. A precocious child, he asked what lay beyond Heaven at age five and grasped the import of the Classic of Filiality (Xiaojing) at age eight. After losing his father, Zhu Song (1097-1143), in his youth, he was raised in the company of several eclectic scholars, including Buddhists. A prodigy, he passed the top-level jinshi exam (the “presented scholar” exam) at the young age of nineteen, drawing on Chan Buddhist notions in his answers. He continued to nurture an eclectic interest in Daoism and Buddhism until he became the student of the Neo-Confucian master Li Tong (1093-1163) in 1160. Zhu’s father had recommended that he study under Li, but Zhu delayed seeing him until age 30, when he had spiritual doubts. A master in the tradition of the Cheng brothers, Li convinced Zhu of the superiority of the Confucian Way and cultivation, to which Zhu devoted himself for the next forty years. Having passed the jinshi examination, Zhu was qualified to hold office and was assigned to several prefectural administrative posts. But Zhu was critical of central court policy on several key issues and preferred temple guardianships, which gave him leisure to read, write and teach. (This also shielded him from the cutthroat politics at court where his frankness would have been literally fatal to him.) He thus became a productive scholar who made lasting contributions to classicism, historiography, literary criticism and philosophy. He was also a master of elegant prose and poetry.

As a renowned teacher, Zhu taught the classics and Neo-Confucianism to hundreds, if not thousands, of students. His oral teachings are preserved in the Classified Dialogues of Master Zhu (Zhuzi yulei). He also published critical, annotated editions of several classics, including the Book of Change (Yijing) and the Book of Odes (Shijing), of specific Neo-Confucianism works, including the works of Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai and the Cheng brothers, and a more encompassing Neo-Confucian anthology, Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsi lu). Devoted to his work, he kept busy virtually to his last breath when he was rethinking and discussing the Great Learning. Throughout life, he sought to reestablish the fundamental principles and ideals of Confucianism in order to restore the vitality of China’s cultural and political integrity as a Confucian society, since those seeking spiritual guidance and solace were inclined to favor Daoism and Buddhism over the spiritually impoverished alternative of bureaucratic Confucianism. Moreover, he thought the empire needed the spiritual élan of authentic Confucian values to meet the challenge of barbarian encroachers. His patriotism, commitment to the tradition and devotion to scholarship and education remain an inspiration to this day in East Asia and throughout the world.

2. Philosophy of Human Nature and Approach to Self-Cultivation

Zhu's complex theory of human nature registered the possibility of evil as well as that of sagehood. On his theory, while (following Mencius, 372-289 BCE) people are fundamentally good (that is, originally sensitive and well-disposed), how one manifests this original nature will be conditioned by one's specificqi endowment (one's native talents and gifts), and one's family and social environment. These together yield one's empirical personality, intelligence and potential for cultivation and success. Zhu thought difference in individual disposition, character and aptitude for moral self-realization are due to variations inqi endowments and environments.

Preceding generations of Neo-Confucian scholars had tended not to register the complexity of human nature and the wide range of individual differences and advocated relatively straightforward approaches to self-cultivation as purifying the mind to elicit the natural responses of one’s original goodness. They tended to understand this process in itself to constitute self-realization. For example, Zhu's teacher Li Tong had strongly advocated a form of meditation called "quiet sitting," the efficacy of which the active young Zhu had doubted from the outset, at least for himself. Several years later, Zhu held discussions with Zhang Shi (1133-80), a follower of Hu Hong (1106-61), who had advocated “introspection in action.” Zhu initially embraced this approach, but soon found that it was not viable for himself. He found that such introspection in the heat of action could not inform or guide action. It tended to impede the flow of effective deliberate action by making one too self-conscious.

Zhu Xi's ingenious solution was a two-pronged approach to cultivation that involved nurturing one's feeling of reverence (jing) while investigating things to discern their defining patterns (li). Reverence, a virtue taught by Confucius (551-479 BCE) and the classics, serves to purify the mind, attune one to the promptings of the original good nature and impel one to act with appropriateness (yi). At the same time, by grasping the defining, interactive patterns that constitute the world, society, people and upright conduct, one gains the key to acting appropriately. The mind that is imbued with a feeling of reverence and comprehends these patterns will develop into a good will (zhuzai) dedicated to rectitude and appropriate conduct.

Interestingly, in later life, Zhu regarded this conception of cultivation and realization as too complicated, gradual and difficult to complete. Like Confucius, he came to accept that one must, on embarking on moral self-cultivation, establish the resolve (lizhi) to realize the Confucian virtues and become an exemplary person (junzi), a master of appropriateness in human conduct and interpersonal affairs.

3. Moral Cosmic Synthesis

In "A Treatise on Humanity" (Renshuo), Zhu Xi articulates and systematizes the classical Confucian ideal of humanity (ren) in simultaneously cosmic and human perspective. At the same time, he effectively criticizes competing accounts of "humanity" on logical, semantic and ethical grounds. Following early tradition, Zhu associates humanity with cosmic creativity. At its root, humanity is the impulse of "heaven and earth" (the cosmos) to produce things. It is manifested vividly in the cycle of seasons and the fecundity of nature. (The settled Chinese terrain and climate were moderate and productive, supporting the view that nature generally was fecund and afforded suitable conditions for human flourishing.) This impulse to produce is instilled in all of the myriad creatures, but in man it is sublimated into the virtue of “humanity” ("authoritative personhood"), which, when fully realized, involves being caring and responsible to others in due degree. Zhu Xi similarly correlates the four stages of creativity and production in the cosmos and nature -- origination, growth, flourishing and firmness -- that were first indicated in the Book of Change, with the four cardinal virtues enunciated by Confucius -- humanity, appropriateness, ritual conduct and wisdom. He thus portrays the realized person as both a vital participant in cosmic creativity and a catalyst for the flourishing and self-realization of others. On this basis, Zhu goes on to formulate the definitive definition of ren (humanity, authoritative personhood) for the subsequent tradition: "the essential character of mind" and "the essential pattern of love." The virtue of ren grounds the disposition of mind as commiserative and describes the core of moral self-realization as love for others (other-directed concern), appropriately manifested.

4. Metaphysical Synthesis

Zhu Xi erected a metaphysical synthesis that has been compared broadly to the systems of PlatoAristotleThomas Aquinas and Whitehead. These “Great Chain” systems are hierarchical and rooted in the distinction between form and matter. Zhu advanced Zhou Dunyi's dynamic conception of reality as shown in the "Diagram of the Supreme Polarity" (Taiji tu), in order to conceive the Cheng brother's concept of li (pattern, principle) and Zhang Zai's notion of qi (cosmic vapor) as organically integrated in a holistic system. In Zhou's treatise, Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity (Taiji tu shuo), Zhu discerned a viable account of the formation of the world in stages from the original unformed qi, to yin and yang, the five phases -- earth, wood, fire, water and metal -- and on to heaven, earth and the ten thousand things. Zhu blended this conception with ideas from the Book of Change and its commentaries in setting forth a comprehensive philosophy of cosmic and human creativity, providing philosophical grounds for the received Confucian concepts of human nature and self-cultivation. Zhu's penchant for thinking in polarities—li and qi, in particular—has continued to stir critics to regard him as a dualist who used two concepts to explain reality. For his part, any viable account of the complexity of phenomena must involve two or more facets in order to register their complexity and changes.

5. Key Interpreters of Zhu Xi

Zhu Xi was an active scholar-intellectual who held discussions and disputes with other scholars, both in correspondence and in person. He can be known by contrast with others as well as through his positive views. For example, his series of letters with Zhang Shi on the topic of self-cultivation, preserved in theCollected Writings of Master Zhu (Zhuzi wenji), provides an enlightening record of these dedicated Confucians’ quest for a well-grounded, effective approach to self-cultivation. He debated with Lu Zuqian (1134-1181) on the nature of education. Zhu focused on the Confucian Way and moral practice, while Lu argued for a broader-based humanities approach. He held a series of debates with Lu Jiuyuan (Xiangshan, 1139-93) on the nature of realization and moral conduct. Whereas Zhu advocated regimens of study, reflection, observation and practice, Lu spoke simply of reflecting on the self and clarifying the mind, considering that once the mind was clear one would know spontaneously what to do in any situation. Zhu also corresponded with the “utilitarian” Confucian scholar Chen Liang (1143-94), who disputed Zhu’s focus on individual moral realization and the received “Way” with a broader institutional approach that was more sensitive to empirical facts and conditions. Zhu generally eclipsed all of the other scholars of his day, partly because he outlived them and had so many students, but mainly because his system was so compelling. It was comprehensive yet nuanced, tightly reasoned yet accommodating of individual differences. It preserved the essential Confucian Way yet ramified it to meet the challenges of Buddhism and Daoism as spiritual teachings. Zhu’s influence rose at the end of the Southern Song dynasty and became decisive during the Yuan dynasty, which adopted his edition of the Four Books as the basis of the imperial examination system arranged by scholars trained in his approach.

While raising his standing in pedagogy, this focus on the Four Books at the expense of Zhu’s deeper, more nuanced texts and dialogues opened the door to philosophic criticism. A schematic presentation of Zhu’s cosmic theory of pattern (li) and qi lay in the background of his commentary to the Four Books, which easily opened him to charges of dualism and of reading abstract categories into the essentially practical ancient texts. Because his commentary was focused on reading and understanding the meaning, intent and cultivation message of the Four Books, critics generalized that Zhu and his method were essentially scholastic and would be myopic and stilted in facing real situations. Anyone who peruses the corpus of Zhu’s writings and dialogues, however, will find that his ontology is not a crude dualism but a holism built of mutually implicative elements that never exist in separation. Also, his reflections are always informed by knowledge of history, current events and practical observation, as his method of observation applies generally to objects (and self) and phenomena while respecting but not privileging texts. Even his comments on Confucius and Mencius often refer back to the person and the speech context, and, thus, are not entirely scholastic. His method of observation opened the door to breakthroughs beyond the “verities” of the classics, though he was careful not to play up this fact because most of his colleagues sought the truth in the texts, thinking empirical facts were distractions from the essential Heavenly-patterning (tianli) reflected more adequately in the canonical texts.

Whereas early generations of Zhu’s followers were acquainted with his broader learning, style and spirit, Confucians of the Ming and Qing dynasties knew him mostly through his edition of the Four Books, through which they targeted their criticisms of his thought. Zhu’s most eminent critic was the Ming scholar-official Wang Yangming (Wang Yang-ming, 1472-1529). In youth, Wang had admired Zhu’s learning and once even attempted to try out his approach to observation, “investigate things to discern their defining patterns.” But, after diligently “observing” bamboo for several days, Wang became ill and got no special insight into the pattern or meaning of bamboo or anything else. He therefore rejected Zhu’s approach to observation as too objective, as outward rather than inward. In the twentieth century, Qian Mu observed that Zhu would only make such observations with guiding questions in mind, around which to focus his observations; he never would have countenanced just looking, which would turn up nothing that wasn’t obvious. For example, having heard a monk claim that bean sprouts grow faster by night than by day, Zhu measured the growth of some bean plants after twelve hours of daylight and of nocturnal darkness, respectively, and found that the plants exhibited the same rate of growth day and night. (The monk’s claim had been based on Mencius’ idea that the qi was more vital at night.) For his part, Wang transformed Zhu’s theory of observation into a pragmatic theory, thereby gearing observation directly to discernment and response—knowing how to act. Thus, Wang formulated a famous slogan that “knowledge and action form a unity.” Later, he argued that knowledge is not essentially objective and factual, but rooted in an inborn moral sensitivity (liangzhi), which is elicited by clarifying the mind so that one becomes actively responsive to one’s moral impulses (liangneng). It could be said that, in his criticisms, Wang was reacting more to the scholastic attitudes fostered by the examination system than to Zhu Xi himself. Wang ultimately respected Zhu and went on to compile a text attempting to show that in later life Zhu had changed his approach in a subjective, practical way that anticipated Wang’s approach.

Scholars of the late Ming through early Qing period (mid-seventeenth to early eighteenth century), notably, Wang Fuzhi (1619-92) and Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1723-77), disputed Zhu on philosophical and textual grounds. Whereas Zhu had insisted on the priority of “pattern” over qi, (roughly, form over matter), Wang and Dai followed the Northern Song thinker Zhang Zai in affirming the priority of qi, viewing patterns as a posteriori evolutionary realizations of qi interactions. They thought this account dissolved the threat of any hint of dualism in cosmology, ontology and human nature. For his part, Zhu Xi would have responded that, fundamentally, “pattern” is implicated in the very make-up and possible configurations of qi; which is why the regular a posteriori patterns can emerge. “Pattern” provides for the standing orders and processes, based on the steady interactions of yin-yang, five phases, etc., that give rise to the heaven-earth world order, with its full complement of ten thousand things. The fundamental a priori patterns are thus necessary to the world order and provide the fecund context in which the a posteriori forms emerge continuously. Wang and Dai’s qi-based view could not account for existence and the world order in this sense. At the same time, Zhu did not think that “patterns” were absolutely determinative. They just set certain “possibilities of order” that are realized when the necessary qiconditions obtain. For the most part, he registered the range of randomness and free flow in qi activity that is best exemplified in the randomness of weather systems and seismic events.

As to textual grounds, Wang and Dai argued that Zhu was so enamored of his metaphysics of pattern andqi that he constantly read them into the classical texts. For example, Dai said Zhu blandly associated Confucius’ term tian (heaven) with his own notion of li (pattern; principle), quoting Analects 11:9 where Confucius, in sorrow over the death of his disciple Yan Hui, cried that “Heaven had forsaken” him. Could Zhu reasonably claim that Confucius was crying that li had forsaken him? Critics tend to find Dai’s counter-intuitive example against Zhu’s approach compelling. However, consulting Zhu’s original commentary, we find that he noted that this phrase expressed Confucius’ utmost sorrow, that he felt Yan Hui’s death as if it was his own, without mentioning “pattern.” This example does not prove Wang and Dai’s claim. It illustrates that Zhu’s commentary was nuanced and sensitive to pragmatic, situational usages despite his penchant to see his own notion of “pattern” in some of Confucius’ usages of “heaven.” Moreover, the classicist Daniel Gardner shows that Zhu’s commentary was not intended as simply a glossary with comments. It was intended as a guide to self-cultivation. Hence, Zhu sometimes recast passages in the Analects more generally to show their broader implications for self-cultivation and realization, often with the isolated countryside student in mind. Gardner shows that Zhu thus had enriched the text as a vital tool for self-cultivation, whereas the earlier commentaries of the Han and Tang dynasties had just given glosses necessary for answering examination questions.

Known in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries in the West due to the work of Jesuits in China, Zhu Xi’s thought and texts were made more widely available to western scholarship in the late nineteenth century. Early in the twentieth century, a Chinese student of John Dewey (1859-1951) at Cornell, Hu Shi (1891-1962), initially followed the empirical, textual Qing scholars in viewing Zhu as a scholastic metaphysician. But, after reading Zhu’s Dialogues in old age, Hu contended that Zhu’s method of observation was not scholastic but essentially scientific in nature. J.C. Bruce, who translated a book of Zhu’s collected writings in the 1920s, viewed Zhu’s notion of li (pattern; principle) in light of Stoic natural law. From the 1930s, the eminent historian of Chinese philosophy, Feng Youlan, interpreted li along the lines of platonic Forms making Zhu Xi appear to be an idealist and abstract thinker. In the 1950s, Carsun Chang naturalized the notion of li by aligning it with the Aristotelian “nature” or “essence,” thereby locking Zhu’s thought into a sort of descriptive metaphysics.

From the 1960s, Mou Zongsan interpreted and criticized Zhu’s ontology and ethics on Kantian grounds, saying he erected an a priori framework but then illicitly sought to derive further a priori knowledge (of patterns) by a posteriori means (observation). In the 1970s, the intellectual historian, Qian Mu examined and explained Zhu Xi’s thought directly on its own terms, without reading western concepts and logical patterns into his system. Scholars wanting to read Zhu Xi on his own terms, unmediated by western thought, turn to the five volume Zhu Xi anthology edited by Qian Mu as a rich starting point.

In 1956, Joseph Needham, a scientist, made a highly significant breakthrough by interpreting Zhu’s system in terms of a process philosophy, Whitehead’s organic naturalism. Needham successfully recast much of Zhu’s language in naturalistic rather than metaphysical terms. The cultural, moral dimension of Needham’s account has been developed by Cheng-ying Cheng and John Berthrong, while the scientific dimension has been examined by Yung Sik Kim. In the 1980s, A.C. Graham offered the most insightful and apt account of Zhu’s terminology and pattern of thought in, “What Was New in the Ch’eng-Chu Theory of Human Nature?” and other writings. Graham showed decisively that the term li refers to an embedded contextual “pattern,” rather than to any sort of abstract form or principle. He reminded us that the term li never figures in propositions or logical sequences, as would be natural for “principle.” Rather,li are always conceived as structuring, balancing, modulating, guiding phenomena, processes, reflection and human discernment and response. For example, one never finds moral syllogisms in Zhu Xi’s writings. Everything he says is about moral emotional intelligence: attunement, sensitivity, discernment, and response. Kirill Thompson has explored and extended Graham’s interpretation in a series of studies. Joseph Adler examines the roles played by the Book of Change and Zhou Dunyi in Zhu’s thought, while Thomas Wilson and Hoyt Tillman have shown the extent to which Zhu Xi re-visioned, revised and recast the Confucian Way. Wilson is interested in Zhu’s account of the Way as a sort of educational-ideological revision, and Tillman is interested in how Zhu’s account of the Way eventually snuffed out other competing versions that might have offered more practical and liberal openings in late imperial China.

In summary, the depth and range of Zhu Xi’s thought were unparalleled in the tradition. Zhu Xi studies continue to be vital, wide-ranging and contentious, drawing growing global, cross-cultural interest.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adler, Joseph (1998). “Response and Responsibility: Chou Tun-I and Confucian Resources for Environmental Ethics” in Mary Tucker and John Berthrong ed. Confucianism and Ecology: The Interpretation of Heaven, Earth, and Humans, Cambridge: Harvard UP.
    • Expansion and application of Zhou Tunyi and Zhu Xi’s ideas to frame a cogent environmental ethic. Clear and thoughtful.
  • (1999). “Chu Hsi’s Use of the I ching” in Kidder Smith, ed., Sung Dynasty Uses of the I ching, Princeton: Princeton UP.
    • Readable and informative survey. Complements the following text.
  • (2002). “Introduction to the Classic of Change” by Chu Hsi: Translation with introduction and notes, Provo: Global Scholarly Publications.
    • Zhu Xi’s guide to understanding and using the Book of Change. Fascinating. Clear translation and commentary. A major contribution to Zhu Xi and Book of Change studies.
  • Berthrong, John H. (1994). Concerning Creativity: A Comparison of Chu Hsi, Whitehead, and Neville, Albany: SUNY Press.
    • Well-developed “process philosophy” interpretation of Zhu’s speculative thought; see Needham 1956a and 1956b.
  • Bruce, J. Percy (1923). Chu Hsi and His Masters: An Introduction to the Sung School of Chinese Philosophy, London: Probsthain.
    • Pioneering historical study.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit (1963). “The Great Synthesis in Chu Hsi,” in A Source Book In Chinese Philosophy,Princeton: Princeton UP, 605-63.
    • Translations of Zhu’s principal essays and statements on key terms, drawn primarily from Zhuzi quanshu; clear and thoroughly annotated.
  • (1966). Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology Compiled by Chu Hsi and Lu Tsu-ch’ien, New York: Columbia UP.
    • Zhu’s compendium of important early Neo-Confucian pronouncements; clear and well annotated.
  • (ed.) (1986). Chu Hsi and Neo-Confucianism. Honolulu: Hawaii UP.
    • Detailed studies of key issues in Zhu Xi scholarship; for the specialist.
  • (1987). Chu Hsi: Life and Thought. Hong Kong: Hong Kong UP.
    • (General essays; clear and accessible.)
  • (1989). Chu Hsi: New Studies. Honolulu: Hawaii UP.
    • Detailed studies of key issues in Zhu Xi scholarship; for the specialist.
  • Chang, Carsun (1957). “Chu Hsi, The Great Synthesizer,” in The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought, vol. 1, New York: Bookman, 243-332.
    • Aristotelian account of Zhu’s philosophy, viewed in contrast to Zhu’s rivals’ opinions. Attempted corrective of Feng’s platonic reading of Zhu Xi; see next entry.
  • Feng, Youlan (1953). “Chu Hsi,” trans. D. Bodde in A History of Chinese Philosophy, 2 vols., Princeton: Princeton UP, vol. 2, 533-71.
    • Highly influential pioneering platonic account of Zhu’s thought in English; technical but clearly presented.
  • Gardner, Daniel (1986). Chu Hsi and Ta-hsueh: Neo-Confucian Reflection on the Confucian Canon,Cambridge: Harvard UP.
    • Translation of Zhu’s commentary on the “Great Learning,” a major classical cultivation text; with excellent commentary and supporting essays.)
  • (1990). Learning to Be a Sage: Selections from the Conversations of Master Chu, Arranged Topically,Berkeley: California UP.
    • (Zhu’s teachings on learning and study as a method of self-cultivation; very clear and accessible.
  • (2003). Zhu Xi’s Reading of the Analects: Canon, Commentary and the Classical Tradition, New York: Columbia UP.
    • Insightful, corrective study of Zhu’s mission and accomplishment in writing this commentary.
  • Graham, A.C. (1986) “What was New in the Ch’eng-Chu Theory of Human Nature?” in Wing-tsit Chan (ed) Chu Hsi and Neo-Confucianism, Honolulu: Hawaii UP, 138-157.
    • Ground-breaking study; corrective reinterpretation of Zhu’s main concepts and ethical thought.
  • Kim, Yung Sik (2000). The Natural Philosophy of Chu Hsi 1130-1200, Philadelphia: American Philosophical Society.
    • Clear and multifaceted study of Zhu’s proto-scientific efforts and achievements; see Thompson 2002b for critical analysis.
  • Lovejoy, Arthur O. (1936 & 1964) The Great Chain of Being: A Study of the History of an Idea,Cambridge: Harvard UP.
    • An account of hierarchical systems in the West, to which Zhu’s system is a distant cousin; see Thompson 1994 for discussion.
  • Needham, Joseph (1956a). “The Neo-Confucians,” in Science and Civilisation in China, vol. 2,History of Scientific Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 455-95.
    • Highly influential organismic account of Zhu’s thought; lucid and fascinating.
  • Needham, Joseph (1956b). “Chu Hsi, Leibniz, and the Philosophy of Organism,” in the preceding book, 496-505.
    • Highly influential organismic account of Zhu’s thought; lucid and fascinating.
  • Schirokauer, Conrad (1962). “Chu Hsi’s Political Career: A Study in Ambivalence,” in A. Wright and D. Twichert (eds) Confucian Personalities, Stanford: Stanford UP, 162-88.
    • Detailed but engaging account.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (1988) “Li and Yi as Immanent: Chu Hsi’s Thought in Practical Perspective,”Philosophy East and West 38 (1): 30-46.
    • Corrective account of Zhu’s ontology and ethical theory; lucid and informative.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (1991). “How to Rejuvenate Ethics: Suggestions from Chu Hsi,” Philosophy East and West (41): 493-513.
    • Examination of how Zhu Xi’s thought could rejuvenate contemporary western ethics.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (1994). “Hierarchy of Immanence: Chu Hsi’s Pattern of Thought,” Humanitas Taiwanica (Wen-shih-che hsueh-pao, National Taiwan University (42): 1-30.
    • Examines parallels and differences between Zhu’s philosophy and Great Chain philosophies of the western tradition, in order to reveal strengths and special features of Zhu’s system.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (2002a). “Ethical Insights from Chu Hsi,” in M. Barnhart, ed., Varieties of Ethical Reflection, New York and London: Lexington Books.
    • Presentation of Zhu’s method of ethical thinking, with applications to some difficult issues in Western ethics.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (2002b). “Review article of “Yung Sik Kim, The Natural Philosophy of Chu Hsi 1130-1200,” China Review International (9): 165-80.
    • Critical examination of Kim’s study of Zhu’s proto-scientific thought.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (2007). “The Archery of Wisdom in the Stream of Life: Zhu Xi’s Reflections on the Four Books,Philosophy East and West, vol. 56, no. 3 (July).
    • Study of Confucius and Mencius’ fascinating notion of wisdom in the light of Zhu Xi’s salient reflections.
  • Tillman, Hoyt (1992). Confucian Discourse and Chu Hsi’s Ascendancy, Honolulu: Hawaii UP.
    • Detailed historical study that situates Zhu in the context of the intellectual issues and debates of the day.
  • Wilson, Thomas A. (1995) Genealogy of the Way: the construction and uses of the Confucian tradition in late imperial China, Stanford: Stanford University Publications.
    • New approach that sees politics and ideology in the competing accounts of the Confucian Way.
  • Wittenborn, Allen (1991). Further Reflections at Hand: A Reader, New York: University Press of America.
    • Useful compendium of Zhu’s philosophic pronouncements; clear translation with detailed commentary.
  • Zhu Xi (1130-1200). Zhuzi yulei (Classified Dialogues of Master Zhu), trans. J.P. Bruce, The Philosophy of Human Nature, London: Probstain, 1922.
    • Compendium of Zhu’s moral psychology drawn from Zhuzi quanshu (“Complete” Works of Master Zhu), abstruse. Other translated selections can be found in Chan 1963, 1966; Gardner 1986, 1990, 2003; Wittenborn 1991.

Author Information

Kirill O. Thompson
National Taiwan University

Guo Xiang (c. 252—312 C.E.)

Guo Xiang (also known as Kuo Hsiang and Zixuan) is the author of the most important commentary on the classic Daoist text Zhuangzi (Chuang-tzu). He is responsible for the current arrangement of thirty-three chapters divided into inner, outer and miscellaneous sections. His commentary represents a substantial philosophical achievement that has been compared to the Zhuangzi itself. Ostensibly the purpose of a commentary should be to elucidate the ideas in the original text. However, Guo's Zhuangzi commentary adds many original ideas. It is possible to delve deeper into their meaning by examining the text on which he is commenting as if it were a commentary on the work of Guo. The fact that Guo chose to present his philosophy this way—within the framework of this Daoist classic—has served as a blueprint for the manner in which Confucians, Daoists and, increasingly from Guo's time, Buddhists have engaged in constructive dialogue, building systems of thought which include the strengths of all three systems.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Central Concepts
    1. Lone/Self-Transformation and the Absence of a Creator
    2. Ziran, Action and Nonaction
    3. Comfort with One’s Role (an qi fen)
    4. The Sage
  3. Guo Xiang’s Influence on Chinese Thought
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Very little is known about the life of Guo Xiang. He lived in a time of great political upheaval and yet his own political career was one of consistent and significant success. He maintained a high position within one of the six rebellious factions that contributed to the rapid demise of the Western Jin Dynasty (265-316 CE). This fact is interesting because unlike such contemporary figures as Ji Kang (223-262 CE) or Ruan Ji (210-263 CE), who both retired from what they saw as a corrupt governmental system, Guo remained to play what he regarded as the proper role of an engaged public dignitary.

Like the other great figure of the xuanxue (mysterious or profound learning) movement, Wang Bi (Wang Pi, 226-249 CE), Guo sought to synthesize the accepted Confucian morality within an ontological system that would encompass the insights expressed in the Zhuangzi and the Daodejing (Tao Te Ching). But while Wang Bi put the greatest emphasis on the unitary nature of reality, particularly in the concept of wu (nothingness), Guo emphasized individuality and interdependence. Guo's position is not as diametrically opposed to Wang's as is often assumed, Guo does not claim there is a dualist or objective reality to the world around us and he does maintain the use of dao as the unitary, nameless and formless basis of reality. This reality is expressed as a process Guo calls "self-transformation" or "lone transformation" (zihua or duha) in which all things are responsible for their own creation and for the set of relationships that exist between themselves and the rest of the world. Our self-transformation was and is at each moment conditioned by all the self-transformations coming before us and we in turn condition all the self-transformations that come after us. By shifting the focus onto those relationships, Guo arrives at a view of the transcendent sage that is radically different and innovative. While the traditional view of a Daoist sage was someone who removed himself from the mundane world, for Guo this notion is false and misleading. The social and political environments in which people relate to each other are no less natural than a forest or mountaintop and to a person who appreciates why she exists in the particular relationship to others in which she does, the proper course of action is not to run away, but to become involved. In other words, we must become engaged with the world around us, but not because of a continuous state of existence that we share with people and things around us, rather, it is because of a continuous act of creation that at its core makes us responsible for the world and its proper maintenance.

Ji Kang and Ruan Ji pursued the ideal of "overcoming orthodox teaching and following nature" (yue mingjiao er ren ziran). "Orthodox teaching" (mingjiao) includes the proper behavior being matched to the proper role, such as for a parent, a child, a ruler or a subject. Different xuanxue figures accepted these ideals to different extents, but nearly all held them in distinction to ziran, naturalness or spontaneity. Guo's concept of ziran contained all governmental and social spheres, so it made no sense to try to set the realms of mingjiao and ziran in opposition to each other. For Guo, the roles required by Confucian propriety are not imposed upon a natural system that would otherwise be in chaos. They are, instead, the natural result of the system of spontaneous self-transformation and chaos is merely what results when one fails to recognize one's proper role. Guo directs much of the Zhuangzi's advice about equalizing apparent contradiction in this direction.

There is some controversy over the true authorship of Guo's commentary to the Zhuangzi. The earliest source, the Jin Shu (Standard History of the Jin Dynasty), accuses Guo of plagiarizing all but two chapters of the commentary from Xiang Xiu (d. 300 CE), writing a generation earlier. Current scholarship, while acknowledging that Guo made use of Xiang Xiu's work and other earlier commentaries, still credits Guo as the principal author. The evidence for this recognition falls into three main areas. Firstly, the most innovative philosophical features in the commentary do not correspond with those in other works by Xiang Xiu. Secondly, in the early twentieth century, a postface to the commentary was discovered which details the work Guo carried out and finally, various linguistic analyses and references in other works suggest that Guo is the principal author.

2. Central Concepts

a. Lone/Self-transformation and the Absence of a Creator

Guo calls the process by which all things come into existence "lone transformation" (duhua) or "self-transformation" (zihua). The claim that all things share equally in creating the world does not deny that differences exist, but it does deny that these differences translate into differences of value. That one person may be less talented or intelligent than another does not affect the worth of that person, but rather helps determine the proper role for him to play

Given the importance of self-transformation in Guo's philosophical system, he wished to deny any organizing principle. Even Wang Bi's emphasis on wu (nothingness) came too close to occupying the place of an original cause. It was necessary for Guo to draw the line clearly, even if it meant contradicting the text on which he was commenting. In a note to a section of the Zhuangzi that leaves open the question of whether there is a creator, Guo writes:

The myriad things have myriad attributes, the adopting and discarding [of their attributes] is different, as if there was a true ruler making them do so. But if we search for evidence or a trace of this ruler, in the end we will not find it. We will then understand that things arise of themselves, and are not caused by something else. (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 2)

b. Ziran, Action and Nonaction

The natural, spontaneous state of affairs that results from the process of self-transformation is ziran. Ziran is a compound of two different terms zi, meaning "self" and ran, meaning "to be so," and can be translated as "nature," "the self-so," or "things as they are." While many other Daoist thinkers distinguish ziran from the mundane social world in which we live, for Guo they are identical. Even social hierarchy is the natural result of how things come to be as themselves. When we follow our natures, the result is peace and prosperity. When we oppose them, the result is chaos.

Thus, Guo seeks to provide a specific interpretation to the doctrine of nonaction (wuwei). He writes that "taking no action does not mean folding one's arms and closing one's mouth" (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 11). In chapter 3 of the Zhuangzi, we encounter the story of Cook Ding, who carves an ox, not by using his senses or dexterity, but by equating his idea of who he is with his situation and the task at hand. For Guo, if one has correctly perceived the way in which all things share in the creation of ziran, then correct action in the world will follow naturally.

Therefore, what Guo means by ziran is very different from what Western philosophers refer to as "the state of nature." Ziran is the expression of a naturally peaceful and harmonious system, available to all who can recognize their place.

c. Comfort with One's Role (an qi fen)

One key to the correct appreciation of one's place in the world is Guo's concept of fen, meaning "share" or "role." Guo employs the idea of qi (ch'i), "vital energy" or "vital essence," to explain the manner in which the dao imbues the world with life-giving force. One's natural allotment of qi therefore determines one's fen. The proper functioning of the world and the personal happiness of the people in it is maintained by the correct appreciation of one's place. This is not to say Guo denies the possibility of growth and change, which are clear and necessary parts of nature, including social systems. In the same way that the body has hands, feet and head that play different roles according to their different endowments, so the world functions best when people act according to their proper fen. Thus, one's fen is both the allotment of qi received from heaven and the role one must maintain within the system. Indeed, there is no difference between natural abilities and social obligations.

d. The Sage

For Guo, the Sage (shengren) is someone who directs his talent and understanding for the benefit of society. The phrase neisheng waiwang describes someone who is internally like a sage and outwardly acts as a ruler. In Guo's view, the former necessitates the latter. In chapter one of the Zhuangzi, we read the story of the sage ruler Yao, who attempts to cede his throne to the recluse Xu You, but is rebuffed. In the story, it is clear that Xu You has a greater level of understanding than does Yao, but Guo's commentary presents the matter differently:

Are we to insist that a man fold his arms and sit in silence in the middle of some mountain forest before we say that he is practicing nonaction? This is why the words of Laozi and Zhuangzi are rejected by responsible officials. This is why responsible officials insist on remaining in the realm of action without regret … egotistical people set themselves in opposition to things, while he who is in accord with things is not opposed to them … therefore he profoundly and deeply responds to things without any deliberate mind of his own and follows whatever comes into contact with him … he who is always with the people no matter what he does is the ruler of the world wherever he may be. (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 1)

It seems clear from these sentiments that in Guo's view not only is Yao a better model for a ruler than Xu You, but also that Confucius is a better model for a sage than Zhuangzi.

3. Guo Xiang's Influence on Chinese Thought

The Zhuangzi has long been held in high regard as one of the main pillars of Daoist philosophy, as well as one of the most accessible, entertaining and popular philosophical works of any genre. However the important contribution of Guo to the way in which we understand the Zhuangzi is less well known, particularly in its non-Chinese translations. He deserves credit not only for the external editing and arrangement of the text, but more importantly for developing a philosophical framework that allows for the continued dominance of accepted Confucian codes of proper behavior, yet still keeps open philosophical discussion of wider insights on the nature of reality. While the earlier work of Wang Bi may have eased the entry of Buddhism into the Chinese mainstream, it is within the framework provided by Guo that the three strands of Buddhism, Daoism and Confucianism have found a strategy for coexistence that has contributed to the success and growth of them all.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Allison, Robert E. Chuang-Tzu for Spiritual Transformation. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Aoki, Goro. "Kaku Sho Soshichu shisen" [Examining Guo Xiang's Zhuangzi commentary]. Kyoto kyoiku gaku kiyo 55 (1979): 196-202.
  • Chan, Alan K.L. "Guo Xiang." In The Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. Anthonio S. Cua, New York: Routledge, 2003, 280-284.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • A good selection of translated passages in addition to an excellent treatment of Guo Xiang's thought and xuanxue in general.
  • Feng, Yu-lan (Feng Youlan) trans. Chuang Tzu: A New Selected Translation with an Exposition of the Philosophy of Kuo Hsiang, Shanghai: Commercial Press, 1933. (Reprint, New York: Gordon, 1975.)
  • Feng, Yu-lan (Feng Youlan). A History of Chinese Philsosophy, v. 2, trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
  • Fukunaga, Mitsuji. "Kako Sho no Soshi chu to Ko Shu no Shoshi chu" [Guo Xiang's Zhuangzi commentary and Xiang Xiu's Zhuangzi commentary]. Toho gakuho 36 (1964): 187-215.
    • This was some of the groundbreaking work on the Xiang Xiu controversy. Its findings are summarized in English by Livia Knaul's article in The Journal of Chinese Religions.
  • Fukunaga, Mitsuji. "‘No-Mind' in Chuang-tzu and Ch'an Buddhism." Zinbun 12 (1969): 9-45.
  • Holtzman, Donald. "Les sept sages de la forêt des bambous et la société de leur temps." T'oung Pao 44 (1956): 317-346.
  • Knaul, Livia. "Lost Chuang-tzu Passages." Journal of Chinese Religions 10 (1982): 53-79.
    • This article contains a translation of the "lost" postface, as well as a detailed treatment of the Xiang Xiu controversy.
  • Knaul, Livia. "The Winged Life: Kuo Hsiang's Mystical Philosophy." Journal of Chinese Studies 2.1 (1985): 17-41.
  • Kohn, Livia. Early Chinese Mysticism: Philosophy and Soteriology in the Taoist Tradition. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Kohn, Livia. "Kuo Hsiang and the Chuang-tzu." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 12 (1985): 429-447.
  • Mair, Victor H., ed. Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1983.
  • Mather, Richard B. "The Controversy Over Conformity and Naturalness During the Six Dynasties." History of Religions 9 (1969-1970): 160-180.
  • Robinet, Isabelle. "Kouo Siang ou le monde comme absolu." T'oung Pao 69 (1983): 73-107.
  • Tang Yijie. Guo Xiang. Taibei: Dongda tushugongsi, 1999.
    • One of the most acclaimed biographers of Guo Xiang. Not currently translated into English.
  • Yü, Ying-shih. "Individualism and the Neo-Taoist Movement in Wei-Chin China." In Individualism and Holism: Studies in Confucian and Taoist Values, ed. Donald Munro (Ann Arbor: Center for Chinese Studies, University of Michigan, 1985), 121-155.
  • Ziporyn, Brook. The Penumbra Unbound: The Neo-Taoist Philosophy of Guo Xiang. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Ziporyn, Brook. "The Self-So and Its Traces in the Thought of Guo Xiang." Philosophy East and West 43 (1993): 511-539.
  • Zhuang Yaolang. Guo Xiang xuanxue. Taibei: Liren shuju, 2002.

Author Information

J. Scot Brackenridge
Long Island University
U. S. A.

Yinyang (Yin-yang)

yinyangYinyang (yin-yang) is one of the dominant concepts shared by different schools throughout the history of Chinese philosophy. Just as with many other Chinese philosophical notions, the influences of yinyang are easy to observe, but its conceptual meanings are hard to define. Despite the differences in the interpretation, application, and appropriation of yinyang, three basic themes underlie nearly all deployments of the concept in Chinese philosophy: (1) yinyang as the coherent fabric of nature and mind, exhibited in all existence, (2) yinyang as jiao (interaction) between the waxing and waning of the cosmic and human realms, and (3) yinyang as a process of harmonization ensuring a constant, dynamic balance of all things. As the Zhuangzi (Chuang-tzu) claims, “Yin in its highest form is freezing while yang in its highest form is boiling. The chilliness comes from heaven while the warmness comes from the earth. The interaction of these two establishes he (harmony), so it gives birth to things. Perhaps this is the law of everything yet there is no form being seen.”(Zhuangzi, Chapter 21). In none of these conceptions of yinyang is there a valuational hierarchy, as if yin could be abstracted from yang (or vice versa), regarded as superior or considered metaphysically separated and distinct. Instead, yinyang is emblematic of valuational equality rooted in the unified, dynamic, and harmonized structure of the cosmos. As such, it has served as a heuristic mechanism for formulating a coherent view of the world throughout Chinese intellectual and religious history.

  1. Origins of the Terms Yin and Yang
  2. The Yinyang School
  3. Yinyang as Qi (Vital Energy)
  4. Yinyang as Xingzi (Concrete Substance)
  5. The Yinyang Symbol
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Origins of the Terms Yin and Yang

The earliest Chinese characters for yin and yang are found in inscriptions made on “oracle bones” (skeletal remains of various animals used in ancient Chinese divination practices at least as early as the 14th century B.C.E.). In these inscriptions, yin and yang simply are descriptions of natural phenomena such as weather conditions, especially the movement of the sun. There is sunlight during the day (yang) and a lack of sunlight at night (yin). According to the earliest comprehensive dictionary of Chinese characters (ca. 100 CE), Xu Shen’s Shuowen jiezi (Explaining Single-component Graphs and Analyzing Compound Characters), yin refers to “a closed door, darkness and the south bank of a river and the north side of a mountain.” Yang refers to “height, brightness and the south side of a mountain.” These meanings of yin and yang originated in the daily life experience of the early Chinese. Peasants depended on sunlight for lighting and their daily life routines. When the sun came out, they would go to the field to work; when the sun went down, they would return home to rest. This sun-based daily pattern evidently led to a conceptual claim: yang is movement (dong) and yin is rest (jing). In their earliest usages, yin and yang existed independently and were not connected. The first written record of using these two characters together appears in a verse from the Shijing (Book of Songs): “Viewing the scenery at a hill, looking for yinyang.” This indicates that yang is the sunny side and yin is the shady side of hill. This effect of the sun exists at the same time over the hill.

2. The Yinyang School

According to Sima Tan (Ssu-ma Tan, c. 110 B.C.E.), there existed a school of teaching during the “Spring and Autumn” (770-481 B.C.E.) and “Warring States” (403-221 B.C.E.) periods that bore the name of yinyang. He lists this yinyang school alongside five others (Confucian, Mohist, Legalist, Fatalist, and Daoist) and defines its theory as “the investigation of the shu [art] of yin and yang.” According to him, this school focused on omens of luck and explored the patterns of the four seasons. In other words, the yinyang school was concerned with methods of divination or astronomy (disciplines that were not distinct from one another in early China, as elsewhere in the ancient world) and the calendrical arts (which entailed study of the four seasons, eight locations, twelve du [measures] and twenty-four shijie [time periods]). Just as the Confucians (rujia) arose from the ranks of rushi (“scholar-gentlemen”) who excelled at ritual and music, those of the yingyang school came from the fangshi (“recipe-gentlemen”) who specialized in various numerological disciplines known as shushu (“number-arts”). These shushu included tianwen (astronomy), lipu (calendar-keeping), wuxing (“five phases” correlative theory), zhuguai (tortoise-shell divination), zazha (fortune-telling) and xingfa (face-reading). The Han dynasty chronicle Shiji (Records of the Historian) lists Zou Yan (305-240 B.C.E.) as a representative of the yinyang school who possessed a profound knowledge of the theory of yinyang and wrote about a hundred thousand words on it. However, none of his works have survived.

By the Han dynasty (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.), yinyang was associated with wuxing (“five phases”) correlative cosmology. According to the “Great Plan” chapter of the Shujing (Classic of Documents), wuxing refers to material substances that have certain functional attributes: water is said to soak and descend; fire is said to blaze and ascend; wood is said to curve or be straight; metal is said to obey and change; earth is said to take seeds and give crops. Wuxing is used as a set of numerological classifiers and explains the configuration of change on various scales. The so-called yinyang wuxing teaching – an “early Chinese attempt in the direction of working out metaphysics and a cosmology” (Chan 1963: 245) – was a fusion of these two conceptual schemes applied to astronomy and the mantic arts.

3. Yinyang as Qi (Vital Energy)

The most enduring interpretation of yinyang in Chinese thought is related to the concept of qi (ch’i, vital energy). According to this interpretation, yin and yang are seen as qi (in both yin and yang forms) operating in the universe. In the “Duke Shao” chapter of the Zuozhuan (The Book of History), yin and yang are first defined as two of six heavenly qi:

There are six heavenly influences [qi] which descend and produce the five tastes, go forth in the five colours, and are verified in the five notes; but when they are in excess, they produce the six diseases. Those six influences are denominated the yin, the yang, wind, rain, obscurity, and brightness. In their separation, they form the four seasons; in their order, they form the five (elementary) terms. When any of them is in excess, they ensure calamity. An excess of the yin leads to diseases of cold; of the yang, to diseases of heat. (Legge 1994: 580).

Here, yin and yang are the qi of the universe. These qi flow within the natural as well as the human worlds. They are the basic fabric of existence:

Heaven and earth have their regular ways, and men like these for their pattern, imitating the brilliant bodies of Heaven, and according with the natural diversities of the Earth. (Heaven and Earth) produce the six atmospheric conditions [qi], and make use of the five material elements. Those conditions (and elements) become the five tastes, are manifested in the five colours, and displayed in the five notes. When they are in excess, there ensue obscurity and confusion, and people lose their (proper) nature… There were mildness and gentleness kindness and harmony, in imitation of the producing and nourishing action of Heaven. There are love and hatred, pleasure and anger, grief and joy, produced by the six atmosphere conditions [qi]. Therefore (the sage kings) carefully imitated these relations and analogies (in forming ceremonies), to regulate those six impulses…When there is no failure in the joy and grief, we have a state in harmony with the nature of Heaven and Earth, which consequently can endure long. ( Legge 1994: 708).

Thus qi, a force arising from the interplay between yin and yang, becomes a context in which yinyang is seated and functions. Yinyang as qi provides an explanation of the beginning of the universe and serves as a building block of the Chinese intellectual tradition. In many earlier texts, one may observe how yinyang generates a philosophical perspective on heaven, earth and human beings. Chapter 42 of the Laozi says that "everything is embedded in yin and embraces yang; through chong qi [vital energy] it reaches he [harmony].” It is through yinyang’s function as qi and the interaction between them that everything comes into existence. Zhuangzi also speaks about the “qi of yin and yang”: “When the qi of yin and yang are not in harmony, and cold and heat come in untimely ways, all things will be harmed.” (Zhuangzi ch. 31) On the other hand, “when the two have successful intercourse and achieve harmony, all things will be produced.” (Zhuangzi ch. 21)

The interpretation of yinyang as qi conceives yinyang as a dynamic and natural form of flowing energy, a complementary in the primordial potency of the universe. The Huainanzi offers more detailed explanation of the cosmological process of yin and yang:

When heaven and earth were formed, they divided into yin and yang. Yang is generated [sheng] from yin and yin is generated from yang. Yin and yang mutually alternate which makes four fields [wei, “celestial circles”] penetrate. Sometimes there is life, sometimes there is death, that brings the myriad things to completion. (ch. 2)

This process also explains the beginning of human life. When qi moved, the clear and light rose to be heaven and the muddy and heavy fell to become earth. When these two qi interacted and attained the stage of harmony (he), human life began. This shows that everything is made from the same materials and difference relies on the interaction.

Qi also takes on various forms and is convertible from one form to another with order and pattern. The concept of yinyang supplies a unitary vision of heaven, earth and human beings and makes the world intelligible in terms of a resonance between human beings and the universe. The Guoyu (Discourses of the States) describes how earthquakes took place at the confluence of the Jing, Wei, and Lou rivers during the second year of Duke You of the western Zhou dynasty. A certain Boyang Fu claims that the Zhou empire is doomed to collapse, explaining that

The qi of heaven and earth can’t lose its order. If its order vanishes people will be disoriented. Yang was stuck and could not get out, yin was suppressed and could not evaporate, so an earthquake was inevitable. Now the earthquakes around the three rivers are due to yang losing its place and yin being pressed down. Yang is forsaken under yin so the source of rivers has been blocked. If the foundation of rivers is blocked the country will definitely collapse. This is because of the fact that the flowing water and flourishing land are necessities for the people’s lives. If the water and land cannot sustain the people’s living conditions, the country will inevitably fall. (Discourse of the States 1994: 22).

Not only does this ¬yinyang-flavored explanation claim to illuminate natural phenomena, it also implies that there is an intrinsic relationship between natural events and political systems. Human beings, especially political leaders, must align their virtuous actions with the morally-oriented universe. If they follow and harmonize with (shun) the order and patterns of the universe, they will be rewarded with prosperity and flourishing, but if they go against and conflict with (ni) it, they will be punished with disasters and destruction. Whether one engages in shun or ni depends upon whether yin and yang are in a state of balance. Thus, yinyang provides a heuristic outlook for human understanding as well as ethical guidance for achieving harmony in action. As chapter 8 of the Huainanzi claims:

Yinyang embodies the harmony of heaven and earth, manifests the forms of myriad things, contains qi to transform the things and completes various kinds of things; yinyang extends and penetrates to the deepest level; begins in emptiness then becomes full and moves in boundless lands.

4. Yinyang as Xingzi (Concrete Substance)

Yinyang also has been understood as some concrete substance (xingzhi), according to which yixing and yangxing define everything in the universe. In the Yijing (I-Ching, The Book of Changes), yinyang is presented as xingzhi. Yang was identified with the sun and yin with the moon:

Heaven and earth correlate with vast and profound; four seasons correlate with change and continuity [biantong]; the significance of yin and yang correlate with sun and moon; the highest excellence [zhide] correlates the goodness of easy and simple.(Sishu wujing 1990: 197)

The Guanzi, an important work of the Huang-Lao school, discusses this view along the same lines: “The sun is in charge of yang, the moon is in charge of yin, the stars are in charge of harmony [he].” (Guanzi 2000: 151). This xingzhi interpretation materializes the concept of yinyang in some concrete contexts and shows that the universe is orderly, moral and gendered. The pattern of the world is written in a gendered language. Yinyang is something one can see, feel, and grasp through the senses. For example, in the Liji (Book of Ritual), music represents the he (harmony) of heaven and earth, while li (ritual) represents the order of heaven and earth: “Music is coming from yang, ritual is coming from yin. The harmony of yinyang receives the myriad things.” (Sishu wujing 1990: 525) In the human world, male as yang should be cultivated, otherwise the day will suffer; female as yin should be cultivated too, otherwise the moon will be affected.

According to Dong Zhongshu, (195-115 B.C.E.), both Tian (heaven) and human beings have yinyang. Therefore, there is an intrinsic connection between tian and human beings through the movement of yin and yang. Yinyang is an essential vehicle for interactions between heaven and human beings: “The qi of yinyang moves heaven above as well as in human beings. When it is among human beings it is displayed itself as like, dislike, happy and mad, when it is in heaven it is seen as warm, chilly, cold and hot.” (Dong Zhongshu 1996: 436) In Dong’s cosmological vision, the whole universe is a giant yinyang. One of many examples of this vision is Dong’s proposal to control floods and prevent droughts by proper human interaction. In chapter 74 (“Seeking the Rain”) of his Luxuriant Gems of the Spring and Autumn, Dong asserts that a spring drought indicates too much yang and not enough yin. So one should “open yin and close yang” (1996: 432) He suggests that the government should have the south gate closed, which is in the direction of yang. Men, embodying yang, should remain in seclusion. Women, embodying yin, should appear in public. He even requests all married couples to copulate (ouchu) to secure more yinyang intercourse. It is also important during this time to make women happy. (1996: 436) In chapter 75 (“Stopping the Rain”), Dong alleges that the flood proves there is too much yin so one should “open yang and close yin” (1996: 438). The north gate, the direction of yin, should be wide open. Women should go into concealment and men should be visible. Officers in the city should send their wives to the countryside in order to make sure that yin will not conquer yang. Derk Bodde defines this practice as a “sexual sympathetic magic.” (Bodde 1981: 373)

Finally, yinyang also plays a pivotal role in traditional Chinese thought about health and the human body. The early medical text known as the Huangdi neijing (The Yellow Emperor’s Classic of Internal Medicine) provides a detailed account of physiological functions and pathological changes in the body and guidance for diagnosis and treatment in terms of yinyang. Five zang (organs) -- the kidneys, liver, heart, spleen and lungs -- are classified as yin. They control the storage of vital substance and qi. Six fu (organs) -- the gallbladder, stomach, small and large intestines, urinary bladder and triple burner (referring to three parts of the body cavity: the upper burner, which houses the heart and lungs; the middle burner, which houses the spleen and stomach; and the lower burner, which houses the kidney, urinary bladder and small and large intestines) -- are yang and control the transport and digestion of food. The storage is a yin function, and the transport and transformation of substance is a yang function. But the zang and fu organs can be further subdivided into yin and yang. The activity or function of each organ is its yang aspect, while its substance is its yin aspect. Yin should flow smoothly and yang should vivify steadily. They regulate themselves so as to maintain equilibrium. Yin and yang do not exist in isolation but are in a dynamic state in which they interact and fashion the complicated and intricate system of the human body.

5. The Yinyang Symbol

There is no a clear and definite way to determine the exact date of origin or the person who created the popular yinyang symbol. No one has ever claimed specific ownership of this popular image. However, there is a rich textual and visual history leading to its creation. Inspired by a primeval vision of cosmic harmony, Chinese thinkers have sought to codify this order in various intellectual constructions. Whether to formulate this underlying pattern through words and concepts or numbers and visual images has been debated since the Han dynasty. The question first surfaced in the interpretation of the Yijing. The Yijing is constructed around sixty-four hexagrams (gua), each of which is made of six parallel broken or unbroken line segments (yao). Each of the sixty-four hexagrams has a unique designation; its image (xiang) refers to a particular natural object and conveys the meaning of human events and activities. The Yijing thus has generated a special way to decipher the universe. It mainly incorporates three elements: xiang (images), shu (numbers), and li (meanings). They act as the mediators between heavenly cosmic phenomena and earthly human everyday life. From the Han dynasty through the Ming and Qing dynasties (1368-1912 CE), there was a consistent tension between two schools of thought: the school of xiangshu (images and numbers) and the school of yili (meanings and reasoning). At issue between them is how best to interpret the classics, particularly the Yijing. The question often was posed as: “Am I interpreting the six classics or are the six classics interpreting me?”

For the school of Xiangshu the way to interpret the classics is to produce a figurative and numerological representation of the universe through xiang (images) and shu (numbers). It held that xiangshu are indispensable structures expressing the Way of heaven, earth and human being. Thus the school of Xiangshu takes the position that “I interpret the classics” by means of the images and numbers. The emphasis is on the appreciation of classics. The school of Yili, on the other hand, focuses on an exploration of the meanings of the classics on the basis of one’s own reconstruction. In other word, the school of Yili treats all classics as supporting evidence for their own ideas and theories. The emphasis is more on idiosyncratic new theories rather than the explanation of the classics. In what follows, our inquiry focuses on the legacy of the Xiangshu school.

The most common effort of the Xiangshu school was to draw tu (diagrams). Generations of intellectuals labored on the formulation and creation of numerous tu. Tu often delineate structure, place, and numbers through black and white lines. They are not aesthetic objects but rather serve as a means of articulating the fundamental patterns that govern phenomena in the universe. Tu are universes in microcosm and demonstrate obedience to definite norms or rules. During the Song dynasty (960-1279 CE), the Daoist monk Chen Tuan (906-989 CE) made an important contribution to this tradition by drawing a few tu in order to elucidate the Yijing. Though none of his tu were directly passed down, he is considered the forerunner of the school of tushu (diagrams and writings). It is said that he left behind three tu; since his death, attempting to discover these tu has become a popular scholarly pursuit. After Chen Tuan, three trends in making tu emerged, exemplified by the work of three Neo-Confucian thinkers: the Hetu (Diagram of River) and Luoshu (Chart of Luo) ascribed to Liu Mu (1011-1064 CE), the Xiantian tu (Diagram of Preceding Heaven) credited to Shao Yong (1011-1077 CE), and the Taijitu (Diagram of the Great Ultimate) attributed to Zhou Dunyi (1017-1073 CE). These three trends eventually led to the creation of the first yinyang symbol by Zhao Huiqian (1351-1395 CE), entitled Tiandi Zhiran Hetu (Heaven and Earth’s Natural Diagram of the River) and pictured above at the head of this entry.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bennett, Steven J. “Patterns of the Sky and the Earth: A Chinese Science of Applied Cosmology.” Chinese Science (March 1978) 3: 1-26.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Bodde, Derk. Essays on Chinese Civilization. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1981.
  • Dong, Zhongshu. Luxuriant Gems of the Spring and Autumn. Ed. Su Xing. Beijing: Chinese Press, 1996.
  • Fung, Yu-lan. A Short History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. New York: The Free Press, 1997.
  • Graham, A.C. Yin-Yang and the Nature of Correlative Thinking. Singapore: The Institute of East Asian Philosophies, 1986.
  • Guanzi. Ed. Guan Bo. Beijing: Hua Xia Press, 2000.
  • Guoyu (Discourse of the States). Eds. Wu Guoyi, Hu Guowen and Li Xiaolu. Shanghai: Guji Press, 1994.
  • Huainanzi. Ed. Liu An. Xi’an: Sanqing Press, 1998.
  • Henderson, John B. The Development and Decline of Chinese Cosmology. New York: Columbia University Press, 1984.
  • Inoue, Satoshi. Xianqin Yinyang Wuxing (Pre-Qin Yinyang and Five Phases). Hubei: Education Press, 1997.
  • Kohn, Livia. “Ying and Yang: The Natural Dimension of Evil.” In Philosophies of Nature: The Human Dimension, eds. Robert S. Cohen and Alfred I. Tauber (New York: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997), 91-106.
  • Legge, James. The Chinese Classics: The Ch’un Ts’ew, with Tso Chuen. Taipei: SMC Publishing Inc., 1994.
  • Li, Shen and Guo Yu, eds. The Complete Selection of Diagrams of Zhouyi. Shanghai: China Eastern Normal University Press, 2004.
  • Makeham, John. Transmitters and Creators: Chinese Commentators and Commentaries on the Analects. Harvard East Asian Monographs, no. 228. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2003.
  • Needham, Joseph. Science and Civilization in China. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1956.
  • Porkert, Manfred. The Theoretical Foundations of Chinese Medicine: Systems of Correspondence. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1974.
  • Puett, Michael J. To Become a God: Cosmology, Sacrifice and Self-Divination in Early China. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2002.
  • Roth, Harold D. Original Tao: Inward Training (Nei-yeh) and the Foundations of Taoist Mysticism. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999.
  • Rubin, Vitaly A. “The Concepts of Wu-Hsing and Yin-Yang,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 9 (1982): 131-157.
  • Sishu wujing (Four Books and Five Classics). China: Yuling Press, 1990.
  • Yabuuti, Kiyosi. “Chinese Astronomy: Development and Limiting Factors.” In Chinese Science: Explorations of an Ancient Tradition, eds. Shigeru Nakayama and Nathan Sivin (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1973), 91-103.
  • Yang, Xuepeng. Yinyang Qi yu Bianliang (Yinyang Qi and Changes). Beijing: Chinese Science Press, 1993.
  • Yates, Robin D.S. Five Lost Classics: Tao, Huang-Lao, and Yin-yang in Han China. New York: Ballantine Books, 1997.
  • Zhuangzi. Ed. Chen Guying. Beijing: Chinese Press, 1983.

Author Information

Robin R. Wang
Loyola Marymount University
U. S. A.

Huineng (Hui-neng) (638—713)

HuinengHuineng (Hui-neng) a seminal figure in Buddhist history. He is the famous “Sixth Patriarch” of the Chan or meditation tradition, which is better known in Japanese as "Zen"). The focus of an immense body of lore that grew over the centuries, Huineng’s life mirrors the fortunes of Chan itself – a provincial Chinese version of Buddhism that rose to become a major religious and cultural force throughout East Asia. Tradition holds that Huineng was an uncouth “barbarian” youth who, because of his innate intuitive insight, surpassed his more cultured fellow monks to earn the official “dharma seal” certifying the authoritative transmission of Buddhist enlightenment, and thereby earning a lasting place in history. He is intimately associated with the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, one of the most influential texts in all of Chinese Buddhism. Alleged to be a sermon from the lips of Huineng himself, this text provides a gripping first person account of the Master’s life. Its cryptic, yet insightful, discussion of Chan practice lays out the central concerns of Chan cultivation. Huineng’s discussion of the themes of inherent enlightenment, sudden awakening, and the non-dual nature of wisdom (Sanskrit: prajna) and meditation (Sanskrit: dhyana) resounds through later generations of Chan teachers, and continues to pose difficult philosophical challenges to this day.

Table of Contents

  1. Chan Buddhism in Context
  2. Biography
  3. Historical Issues and Mythic Elements
  4. Central Teachings
    1. Major Themes
      1. Original/Inherent Enlightenment (ben jue)
      2. Non-duality
      3. No-thought (wu nian)
      4. Sudden Awakening (dun wu)
      5. The Centrality of Practice
    2. Teaching Style
  5. Influences
  6. Critical Issues
    1. The Role of Reason and Rationality
    2. Sudden vs. Gradual?
    3. The Role of Text (wen) in Life
    4. The Relation of Action (praxis) and Knowledge (theoria)
    5. The Centrality of Ritual (Li)
  7. Impact on Later Buddhist and Chinese Philosophical Traditions
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Chan Buddhism in Context

It is impossible to disentangle Huineng from the story of early Chan. Indeed, it is in sections 49-51 of the Platform Sutra that Huineng lays out the classic story of Chan’s origins. According to this account, Chan began with the historical Buddha, Sakyamuni, and his famous “Flower Sermon.” One day the Buddha took his seat before his assembled monks and, instead of speaking, remained silent while holding a single flower aloft in his hand. Of those assembled, only one disciple Mahakashyapa (Sanskrit: “Great Kashyapa”), understood the meaning of the Buddha’s actions. The Buddha publicly recognized Mahakashyapa’s realization and he, in turn, passed the wordless teaching along to his disciples. Eventually the transmission passed to a certain Bodhidharma (c. 470-553 CE), the infamous “First Patriarch,” who, it is said, brought Chan to southern China, crossing the Yangzi (Yangtze) River on a reed. Recent scholarship has established that a mysterious figure named Bodhidharma was indeed in southern China in the fifth century proclaiming teachings based on the Lankavatara Sutra as well as a simplified but powerful form of dhyana. After his death his disciples carried on his teachings, but most of them never founded lasting lineages. Eventually these teachings were transmitted to Hongren (600-674), the Fifth Patriarch, who taught at Dongshan. Hongren had a number of disciples who spread out through China, establishing their own schools where they taught their own versions of Chan. Some died out but a few flourished, going on to record their histories to establish their particular pedigrees.

Often dubbed “the meditation school,” Chan derives its name from the Chinese term channa, an attempted transliteration of the Sanskrit term dhyana (meditation, concentration). In Japan, it is known as Zen; in Korea, as Son; and in Vietnam, as Thien. In India, dhyana encompassed a wide variety of techniques for training the mind to attain the deep insight into reality necessary for awakening. When Buddhism began making inroads into China in the first and second centuries CE, missionaries brought these techniques with them. Dhyana study proved popular in some circles – in part because of its resemblance to Daoist meditation practices – but it was just one practice alongside of others, such as sutra study, devotional rituals and the performance of charitable works. Only later did Chan become a self-conscious movement with a firm institutional base.

By the sixth century, certain monasteries in the mountainous areas of central and southwestern China became known as places reserved for intense meditation training. The masters at these centers taught methods so powerful that it was rumored that those willing to persevere could awaken in this very life. As time went on several of these meditation masters gained loyal followings and tales of them spread as their disciples established their own monasteries. It was out of this context that Chan as a distinct school (zong, “lineage”) and the legend of its most famous master arose. Modern scholars now agree that many of the stories surrounding Huineng are “mythical” reconstructions and elaborations by later generations of Chan writers. Nonetheless, this mythology tells us a lot about how Chan came to conceive itself as a distinct tradition, at once radically innovative and deeply conservative. This Chan self-conception finds its best articulation in a poem attributed to Bodhidharma, according to which Chan is “a separate transmission outside the scriptures, not relying on words and phrases, directly transmitted from mind to mind.” Such transmission can only occur within the relationship between Master and student; hence, the Master, and the connection to him, is of paramount importance in all Chan schools.

2. Biography

As with many legendary figures, it is difficult to sort fact from fiction when it comes to Huineng. We have many sources of information on him but most were written long after his lifetime. Most scholars of Buddhism now consider the story of Huineng’s life and his role in establishing Chan as a direct line going back to Sakyamuni (the historical Buddha, ca. 6th to 5th centuries BCE) to be little more than pious fiction. While there may be a kernel of historical truth to them, all of the accounts of Huineng’s life (particularly as recorded in the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch) show evidence of later expansion and elaboration. In fact, scholars cannot even agree on the location of Dafan, the temple in which Huineng allegedly recited the Platform Sutra.

The earliest mention of Huineng comes from an inscription for a memorial pagoda in Faxing monastery dated 676. The pagoda was said to commemorate Huineng’s meeting with master Yinzong (627-713), a devotee of the Nirvana Sutra and a renowned master of monastic discipline (vinaya), and the ceremony in which Huineng underwent monastic tonsure, that is, shaving of part of the head. Unfortunately, the actual inscription has not been preserved and so many historians deem it unreliable. The only other record dating back to Huineng’s lifetime just lists him as a student of the Chan master Hongren (Hong-jen).

Later records, of which there are many, probably bear little resemblance to real historical events, and actually contradict each other on certain details. Later traditions concerning Huineng vary tremendously. He seems to go into hiding for several years only to reappear in Nanhai at a monastery presided over by Yinzong. One day after the Master had finished a lecture, Huineng overheard two monks arguing over whether the temple flag or the wind was moving. Huineng abruptly injected himself into this discussion, declaring that in fact it was mind that was moving. Hearing of this, Yinzong sent for Huineng and, bowing to him, asked to be taught the dharma of Hongren. It was Yinzong who oversaw the giving of the tonsure to Huineng, the incident memorialized in the inscription mentioned above. Eventually most accounts of Huineng’s life have him retiring to the Baolin temple. Some traditions speak of Huineng being summoned to the imperial capital by the emperor Zhongzong or possibly the empress Wu Zhao (ca. 625-706). In any case, Huineng declined, preferring to spend his days in the mountains and forests preaching the dharma. He did, however, give the imperial envoy a dharma talk that jolted the messenger into an intense sudden realization. Returning to the capital the envoy reported his experience to the emperor who issued an edict praising Huineng and bestowing special gifts upon him.

Our major source for information on Huineng is the autobiographical portion (sections 2-11) of the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, an immensely complicated text that has undergone numerous revisions over the centuries. Purporting to be a series of sermons delivered by Huineng from a high seat in the lecture hall (the “platform” alluded to in the title) of Dafan Temple, this text remains the only Chinese Buddhist discourse to be accorded sutra (Sanskrit: “scriptural”) status. The earliest extant copy of this sutra, found in a cache of writings discovered in the Dunhuang (Tun-huang) caves in northwestern China, dates to around 850 but it is corrupt and full of errors – probably the result of being copied from an earlier version by a semiliterate scribe. The first section of the text names Fahai, a student of Huineng’s, as transcribing the sermon at the behest of the district governor. Elsewhere the text names Fahai as one of the Master’s ten disciples and “chief monk” of the community. However, Fahai does not appear anywhere else in Chan literature and his exact identity remains unknown. Some scholars suggest the sutra was actually written by a later Chan monk from a different school (possibly the Niutou or “Ox-head” school) around the year 780.

While most scholars do not put much stock in either the Platform Sutra or the other sources on Huineng’s life, we can still use them to piece together something of a biography for him. It seems his family name was Lu and his father had been a minor official who was banished to the provinces where he died when his son was only three. His mother took him to southern China and raised him in extreme poverty. Huineng worked throughout his childhood to support his family by cutting wood. One day when he was a young man, he overheard a man reciting a phrase from the Diamond Sutra and at once he experienced an initial awakening. With his mother’s permission he left home and devoted himself to religious life.

Huineng spent his next years wandering, ending up with a Buddhist nun who was devoted to the Nirvana Sutra. After reciting passages from it one day she asked him to take a turn reading it aloud only to find that he was illiterate. Incredulous, she asked how he intended to learn Buddha’s truth if he could not read the sutras. The youth replied that the nature of Buddha does not depend on words and letters so what need was there to read texts? Amazed at his insight, she suggested he take up monastic life. At this point he declined, but went on to train under a meditation master.

After three years of meditating in a mountain cave, Huineng went to Dongshan (East Mountain) monastery in Hubei, where he met Master Hongren, the “Fifth Patriarch.” Glaring at this supplicant, Hongren asked where he was from and why he was there. Huineng answered simply that he was from the south and had come to learn the dharma (Buddhist doctrine) from him. Hongren retorted that as a southerner, Huineng was a mere “barbarian,” adding, “How could you become Buddha?” Unfazed by the insult, Huineng replied, “Although my ‘barbarian’ body and yours differ, what difference is there in our buddha-nature?” Realizing at once the potential of this coarse youth, Hongren resolved to test him further. He took him in but assigned him to the threshing room, where he labored for nine months, treading the mill to separate the rice grains from their husks.

The most famous incident in Huineng’s story concerns a dharma contest. One day Hongren challenged his charges to each write a verse (gatha) distilling their understanding of their “original natures.” He promised to read them and award his robe (a symbol of dharma transmission; some versions of the story include Hongren’s begging bowl) and the title “Sixth Patriarch” to the student demonstrating true realization. The task quickly devolved onto the shoulders of the head monk, Shenxiu, who, it was assumed, would be the Master’s likely successor. Shenxiu, however, was full of doubt and spent a tortured night considering his options. Finally he stole out and wrote his verse anonymously on the wall of the new dharma hall:

The body is the bodhi tree.
The heart-mind is like a mirror.
Moment by moment wipe and polish it,
Not allowing dust to collect. (section 6)

A straightforward articulation of the necessity of diligent practice, Shenxiu hoped this verse would show the Master that his students had at least some understanding.

The next morning Hongren read the verse and praised it before the community. He burned incense before it and ordered them all to recite it before calling Shenxiu for an interview. In private he commended Shenxiu for his insight, stating that the verse showed he had reached the “gates of wisdom” but had yet to enter. He then suggested Shenxiu take a few more days to compose another verse worthy of being awarded the robe.

Meanwhile, Huineng was still working in the threshing room when a novice wandered by reciting Shenxiu’s verse. Immediately Huineng realized the author of the verse lacked full understanding. Venturing out to the dharma hall, he got someone to write his reply:

Bodhi originally has no tree.
The clear and bright mirror also has no support.
Buddha-nature is constantly purifying and clearing.
Where could there be dust? (section 8)

Very soon word of this new verse spread and eventually the news reached Hongren. The Master came to read it and immediately recognized it as the work of Huineng and that this unknown prodigy was truly enlightened. However, he knew that passing his robe to an uncouth peasant would upset the monastic hierarchy. Therefore he publicly dismissed it as “not complete understanding.” Later, under cover of darkness, Hongren summoned Huineng for a secret audience in which he gave him further teachings. Passing on his robe, the Master admonished him to flee for his life, predicting, however, that eventually he would transmit the teachings. With that, Huineng fled south. After some months, Huineng was traced to a mountain by a band of pursuers intent on killing him and stealing the robe. Most of the pursuers turned back after climbing only halfway but one, Huiming (a former general) reached him on the summit. There, rather than slay the young master, he received the teaching and became enlightened. Thus being recognized as a true Chan Master, Huineng dispatched his new disciple to the north to spread the dharma and convert the populace.

One of the most colorful episodes in Huineng lore concerns his confrontation with a dragon that lived in a pond in front of Baolin temple. The dragon was particularly large and fierce, emerging regularly from the watery depths to create havoc and instill fear in the populace. Fearlessly, the Master taunted the beast for its weakness at only being unable to appear in a large as opposed to smaller form. At once the dragon disappeared only to re-emerge in small form and so show the monk his powers. Unimpressed, the Master challenged the monster to show its courage by entering his bowl. When it did so, the Master quickly scooped the dragon up, took him into the Buddha Hall, and preached dharma to it until it shed its body and departed.

Much as with other great religious figures, so the stories of Huineng’s death are particularly dramatic. The Platform Sutra gives a confused account that may combine several different versions. In essence, however, it records that as he neared his death, the Master called his disciples for a final teaching in the form of a “dharma verse.” All the disciples broke into tears over the imminent departure of their beloved teacher except for one, Shenhui, whom the Master praised for having attained the status of awakening. Chiding the others for the foolishness of their tears, Huineng told them, “All of you sit down. I shall give you a verse, the verse of the true-false moving-quiet. All of you recite it, and if you understand the meaning, you will be the same as I. If you practice with it, you will not lose the essence of the teaching.” (section 48) After this final lesson (during which he outlined the Chan lineage back to the Buddha) Huineng died at the stroke of midnight on August 28, 713. Other traditions, however, have Huineng dying in deep meditation after finishing his last meal. His passing was marked by all manner of cosmic signs: a strange perfume pervading the temple for days, mysterious bright lights, a miraculous rainbow in the sky etc. The Platform Sutra says, “Mountains crumbled, the earth trembled, and the forest trees turned white. The sun and moon ceased to shine and the wind and clouds lost their colors.” (section 54) An inscription by the poet Wang Wei (d. 759) adds “the birds and monkeys cried in anguish.”

Several posthumous stories of Huineng attest to the powerful spell he cast on later generations. Some decades after his passing the emperor sent an envoy to ask for his robe and bowl so that the court might pay them homage. These were sent back with great ceremony a few years later by the succeeding emperor, who purportedly dreamt Huineng asked that they be returned. Later, in 816, Huineng was awarded the official title “Dhyana Master Dajian” (Great Mirror). To this day there is a mummy reputed to be Huineng in the Nanhua monastery located in Caoxi. For centuries it was the focus of intense devotion, and at times was brought to the nearby city of Shanzhou to promote prosperity or ward off plagues and droughts. The mummy was also threatened several times and at least one time was nearly decapitated by rival monks seeking to gain power through possession of the Sixth Patriarch’s head.

3. Historical Issues and Mythic Elements

Historical complexities aside, however, it is the mythic dimensions of Huineng’s story that most excite the imagination. Certainly the traditional account is replete with symbolism and allusion. As a boy Huineng is the quintessential simpleton (cf. the Daoist notion of pu, “simplicity” or “the uncarved block” spoken of in Daode jing 15, 19, 28, 32, 37, 57), an illiterate peasant who, pure and unspoiled by the sophistication of his more educated fellows, serves as the perfect vessel for receiving the sacred wisdom that, in turn, flows through him to posterity. Aside from the allusions to Daode jing just noted, Huineng epitomizes the ideal found in Daode jing 70, “The sage goes about with a coarse cloth on top yet carries jade in his bosom.” We find similar themes in stories of other Buddhist figures (for example, Dao’an, 312-385) as well as the Prophet Muhammad. The tradition of Huineng’s being orphaned and cared for by his mother echoes the biography of Mencius (ca. 385-312 BCE), one of the most revered and mystical of Confucian sages.

Huineng’s potential is recognized by the truly wise (for example, Hongren) but he must first be tested to prove his worth. His assignment to hard labor for nine months in seclusion suggests a type of spiritual gestation. Moreover, Huineng’s attaining official recognition under cover of darkness, symbolized in the passing on of Bodhidharma’s robe and bowl (sacred relics imbued with the Patriarch’s charisma), underscores the drama of this moment and the immense value of his precious wisdom. The tradition that these were buried with him indicates something else of importance: Huineng’s successors would no longer rely on India; Chan would henceforth be a homegrown Chinese tradition. Huineng’s turning down the imperial summons recalls the similar story involving Zhuangzi wherein the Daoist sage prefers to live as a turtle, “dragging his tail in the mud” (Zhuangzi, chapter 17). Finally, the accounts of Huineng’s death clearly echo the earthly passing (parinirvana) of Sakyamuni Buddha. Symbolically, Chan tradition, by drawing such a wide assortment of sacred figures into Huineng’s own story, has effectively absorbed these holy personages’ collective mana. As such, Chan is then empowered to project this “new” sacred aura down through its own lineage.

We can also understand the traditional story of Huineng’s life as an example of the apparently universal “Hero Myth.” He starts off as an unpromising youth living in obscurity who embarks on a great quest. Along the way he is aided by various helpers (the anonymous man who recited the Diamond Sutra, the nun devoted to the Nirvana Sutra, his first meditation teacher). After various adventures he meets a true mentor, the Wise Old Man (Hongren), who recognizes his worth and proceeds to train and test him until he is ready. Then the Wise Old Man passes on the secret knowledge he will need to face all obstacles. The climactic story of Huineng’s flight, pursuit, confrontation on mountain top, and his victory all fit in broad outline the structure of such tales the world over. His encounter with the dragon, of course, is the stereotypical battle with the monster (cf. St. George and the Dragon, Beowulf and Grendel) through which the Hero saves society from the threat of evil and chaos, while his refusal of imperial status demonstrates his humility and desire to avoid self-glorification. In this light, the master’s death marks his apotheosis and rise to divine status, for which he is revered by later generations.

When assessing the life of Huineng and his place in Chan lore, it is vital to bear in mind the centrality of lineage in Chinese culture. Lineage is a primary marker of group identity and solidarity, as well as social recognition. Chan, like other Chinese religious/philosophical traditions, is organized as a system of lineages in which teachings are passed down from Master (Patriarch) to disciple, much as family heritage passes down from father to son. The concern for lineage is most evident in sections 49-51 of the Platform Sutra, where Huineng traces the transmission of his teachings back through various masters to Bodhidharma. In Huineng’s Chan genealogy, Bodhidharma, in turn, received the teachings via a series of Indian masters going back to Sakyamuni. Such an impressive pedigree no doubt brought much prestige to those within the Chan line. The importance of lineage continued through the succeeding generations and was carried over when Chan went to Japan. To this day, Chan teachers trace their lineage back to Huineng. Essentially, Huineng has become the Primary Ancestor of the Chan line, receiving the reverence and devotion typical of ancestral cults throughout East Asia. Metaphorically speaking, Huineng is Chan, and remains so even today.

Such critical analysis of the Platform Sutra and the body of lore surrounding Huineng is not intended to dismiss Chan tradition (particularly in regards to the matter of lineage) as fraudulent. Rather, it helps us understand the concerns of early Chan and the vital role that a charismatic hero such as Huineng plays in rhetorically establishing a distinctive Chan identity. For an analogy we can look to the way in which the great Song scholar Zhu Xi (1130-1200) constructs a lineage for his school of Neo-Confucianism, with Confucius taking the place of Huineng and Master Zhu serving as the Confucian version of Shenhui.

4. Central Teachings

Although Huineng’s mythic biography is fascinating, the Platform Sutra mainly consists of an extended series of dharma talks offering what is at times some rather cryptic advice on Chan cultivation. Like most sermons, the Sutra is not a systematic presentation of defined doctrines and arguments but is an address to the faithful, exhorting them to see into their “original nature” and awaken here and now. Huineng explicitly says that his teachings do not originate with him but are, “handed down from the sages of the past” (section 12). Nonetheless, Huineng does introduce several important ideas and initiates the peculiar style of teaching that comes to be enshrined in later Chan tradition. These teachings tend to overlap and interlock with each other, thereby suggesting the unity-cum-diversity that is one of the hallmarks of Chan thought.

a. Major Themes

i. Original/Inherent Enlightenment (ben jue)

The teaching of “inherent” or “original” enlightenment is a major theme in Huineng’s sermon, and the theoretical basis for most of what he says regarding practice. Its roots go back to Indian teachings concerning the tathagata-garbha (“womb/embryo of Buddha”). Although a complex notion, essentially this teaching comes down to a positive articulation of basic Buddhist views on emptiness (shunyata) and the thoroughly interrelated nature of existence. According to tathagata-garbha teachings, although all beings are mired in ignorance and suffering, our true natures are always pure and luminous – defilements are merely adventitious. Awakening occurs when we pierce through the defilements and allow our original purity to shine forth. While at first glance, the assertion of a seemingly permanent “nature” would seem to contradict the fundamental Buddhist doctrine of anatman (“no [permanent] self”), in fact it does not. The tathagata-garbha is not a substantive essence but an indication of the innate positive tendency towards awakening that is always directly at hand.

Tathagata-garbha teachings had strong appeal for the Chinese, most likely due to their resonance with Confucian ideas of “propriety” (yi, the appropriate manner of acting in a given situation) and humanity’s innate “goodness,” as well as Daoist views of the Way (dao), in which each thing uniquely contributes to the all-encompassing system of the cosmos. These notions also dovetail with the traditional Chinese concern with one’s “nature” (xing, the inborn organic pattern guiding a thing’s development). Together such ideas sketch out a distinctive worldview of dynamic, interactive relationships that unfold in the natural course of things. In this perspective, one can obstruct one’s inherent tendencies or open conscientiously into a more free and responsive way of engagement. In general, the latter is the truer, more proper (or “natural”) way of being. Chinese Buddhists speak of this potential for realization as one’s “Buddha-nature” (fo xing). For Chinese Buddhists, awakening is the natural result of activating or “seeing into” this innate but hidden potential and manifesting it here and now.

Nearly everything Huineng says is predicated on the “Buddha-nature.” We see this clearly in his youthful exchanges with both the nameless Buddhist nun and Master Hongren. Huineng drives this point home in a number of places, often quite explicitly. As he proclaims, “Since Buddha is made by your own nature, do not look for him outside your body. If you are deluded in your own nature, Buddha is then a sentient being; if you are awakened in your own natures, sentient beings are then Buddhas.” (section 35) In this understanding of Buddhahood, one may have an initial awakening (Japanese satori) but this is only a hurried glimpse, yet it provides a vague understanding that spurs one on further – something we clearly see in Huineng’s own life with his first awakening at hearing a passage from the Diamond Sutra.

By rhetorically taking his stand on this inherent enlightenment, Huineng challenges his audience to understand this truth and realize their original natures where they are at this very moment. This is something they can and must do: “Despite heterodox views, passions, ignorance, and delusions, in your own physical bodies you have in yourselves the attributes of inherent enlightenment, so that with correct views you can be saved.” (section 21) It is on this basis that he speaks of such things as the unity of meditation (dhyana) and wisdom (prajna), and the “samadhi of oneness. By realizing one’s “Buddha-nature” one naturally moves beyond habitual “selfish” actions and joining with things in an appropriate and compassionate way.

ii. Non-duality

Another important theme that Huineng preaches concerns the fundamentally “non-dual” nature of existence. This, too, is prone to be misunderstood. Huineng never espouses a mushy notion that “All is One” so much as challenge the assumption that a person stands apart from her/his immediate situation. His target is the self-conscious sense of separation that tends to arise out of deliberative thinking and living. Thus, his focus is not so much theoretical as practical; one must not get caught up in speculative thought but realize (make real) Buddha, one’s true nature, and act accordingly. This fundamental unity comes through in his famous dharma verse through which he won Hongren’s robe. By countering Shenxiu’s verse and its assumptions of duality, Huineng graphically tells us that we must not think of our minds as something distinct that “we” must polish to reflect truth. Rather, we are truth, immediately and directly.

The vision Huineng seeks to impart is one of integrity within our larger context. It is an evocation of wholeness, interrelatedness and participation rather than separation and distinction. One of Huineng’s most provocative presentations of this idea comes in his discussion of meditation. For Huineng, meditation is not a separate “thing” from wisdom, nor do you attain the latter by way of the former. As he says, “Never under any circumstances say mistakenly that meditation and wisdom are different; they are a unity, not two things. Meditation itself is the substance of wisdom; wisdom itself is the function of meditation” (section 13). Later, the Patriarch explains their relationship through the analogy of a lamp and its light: just as the lamp and its illuminating are essentially one, so meditation and wisdom are one.

Huineng also challenges assumptions of separation by advocating the “samadhi of oneness,” or concentrated attention to the present situation: “The samadhi of oneness is straightforward mind at all times, walking, staying, sitting, and lying.” This constitutes an intriguing practice of mindful, meditative action performed with attentive detachment. There are obvious echoes between this practice and the Daoist notion of wei wuwei (“acting without acting”) as well as path of karma yoga outlined by Krishna in the Bhagavad-Gita, and Chan communities to this day seek to instill such an approach to life throughout their daily regimen.

This fundamental unity of existence that one manifests by realizing one’s “Buddha-nature” also informs Huineng’s view of the Pure Land (the “Western Paradise”) which, following the Vimalakirti Sutra (where the Buddha shows his disciples that this world is the Pure Land for those with Pure Mind), he refuses to allow us to conceive the Pure Land as something separate from our current existence. It is, rather, the straightforward mind of the “samadhi of oneness.” In attaining this state of true purity, one finds no obstructions. Or, as Huineng puts it, “If inside and outside are clear, this will be no different from the Western Land” (section 35).

iii. No-thought (wu nian)

Huineng speaks from the standpoint of Ultimate Truth (the inherent “Buddha-nature”) the non-dual reality lying beyond our everyday unenlightened experience of separation and division. To awaken to this Truth, Huineng emphasizes “non-clinging” to any verbal teachings, which only present obstacles to True Awakening. Instead, Huineng stresses the perspective of “no-thought” (wu nian), an open, non-conceptual state of mind that allows one to experience reality directly, as it truly is. As he states, “No thought is not to think even when involved in thought. . . To be unstained in all environments is called no-thought. If on the basis of your own thoughts you separate from environment, then, in regard to things, thoughts are not produced. If you stop thinking of the myriad things, and cast aside all thoughts, as soon as one instant of thought is cut off, you will be reborn in another realm.” (section 13)

Note that Huineng explicitly says “no-thought” is not a state of insentiency, nor is it a way of valorizing irrational, “thoughtless” behavior. Rather, “no-thought” is a highly attentive yet unentangled way of being -- seemingly the only genuine freedom available. Those who act from the perspective of “no-thought” respond compassionately in all situations, untouched by suffering, much the same way the Mahayana scriptures speak of bodhisattvas (enlightened beings who selflessly seek to aid others) who “course in the Perfection of Wisdom.”

iv. Sudden Awakening (dun wu)

Few ideas are so closely associated with Huineng’s Chan than “sudden awakening” (dun wu). Rooted in earlier Buddhist and Daoist teachings, it primarily referred to statements of truth a sage made in relationship to specific audiences. Those that were direct and profound were given to those ready for such a “sudden” dose of reality whereas those that were more indirect and metaphorical were provided for those who needed to be led “gradually.” The difference, thus, lies in those who receive the teachings rather than the actual content of the teachings. Some are, as it were, closer to their “Buddha-nature.” According to later Chan tradition, Huineng advocated the (superior) way of “sudden awakening” in contrast to Shenxiu, whose dharma verse clearly points to the (inferior) way of “gradual awakening.”

This polemical distinction, however, does not capture Huineng’s full meaning. The term dun, typically translated as “sudden,” might better be rendered as “poised” or “ready” for some great undertaking Those who experience such “sudden awakening” are those who are “keen” and “fast,” ready to awaken in action, poised to break through to fuller, wise and compassionate living. By contrast, those who are “dull” are “slow,” not quite as prepared or attentive to respond in so wise a fashion. Equally as important, moreover, is Huineng’s insistence that from the standpoint of the “Buddha-nature,” there is no “sudden” or “gradual.” Thus he notes, “The dharma itself is the same, but in seeing it there is a slow way and a fast way. Seen slowly, it is the gradual; seen fast it is the sudden [teaching]. Dharma is without sudden or gradual, but some people are keen and others dull; hence the names ‘sudden’ and ‘gradual.’” (section 39)

v. The Centrality of Practice

In many respects the necessity of practice may be the single most important refrain in Huineng’s sermons. Huineng repeatedly emphasizes that Chan life, awakening, is not attained through study or careful deliberation but live action. One of the best instances comes immediately after he explains what seated meditation (zuochan; Japanese zazen) is: “Good friends, see for yourselves the purity of your own natures, practice and accomplish for yourselves. Your own nature is the Dharmakaya [“Body of the Teaching,” the Ultimate Truth] and self-practice is the practice of Buddha; by self-accomplishment you may achieve the Buddha Way for yourselves.” (section 19)

To achieve Buddhahood one must be Buddha, that which, paradoxically, one always already is. Such awakened living cannot be adequately explained through words so much as demonstrated and acted upon. In this sense, one learns it directly by conforming to an already established pattern, internalizing it, and then acting this out in any given situation. An analogy might be learning to play a musical instrument or another activity such as riding a bicycle. Chan practice is Chan doing, something that can only be learned through careful imitation of a living example – one’s Master. It is this type of first-hand learning to which Bodhidharma refers in his famous verse: “A special transmission outside the scriptures; not dependent on words and letters.”

Ironically, despite his constant injunctions to wise action, Huineng provides little detail on the specifics of practice. As a result, scholars are unsure what sorts of actual practices were taught in early Chan communities. This silence on specifics, however, turned out to be a point in Huineng’s favor, as his injunctions could readily be applied to a wide variety of Chan styles through the ages.

b. Teaching Style

Huineng’s presentation in the Platform Sutra pioneered Chan’s distinct teaching style that makes use of paradox and cryptic statements aimed at jolting students out of their habitual discursive reasoning. By no means, of course, is Huineng the inventor of such discourse (it is very common in Buddhist and Daoist texts) but in the Platform Sutra Huineng uses it with uncanny skill. As such, it warrants close examination.

One of the most significant features of Huineng’s discourse is its overwhelmingly dialogical character. Although it has its share of lectures, this “sermon” is more often a series of exchanges between Huineng and various interlocutors. Such a literary form calls for one to shift perspective back and forth. Like normal conversation, so a dialogue also tends to lead one beyond the immediate horizon, inviting listeners (and readers) to come along. Dialogue is a common form in Western philosophy (most notably in Plato’s dialogues) yet there is also ample precedent in both Buddhist and Chinese literature. The Perfection of Wisdom Sutras, the primary scriptures of Mahayana Buddhism, are all extended dialogues between the Buddha and his disciples, while most of the Analects and the Zhuangzi are dialogues as well. The dialogue is a powerful rhetorical form, dramatic and challenging, one that demands a response from its audience.

One of the more common rhetorical forms in Buddhism is paradox, and Huineng certainly makes use of this in his teaching. Thus, for instance, he admonishes his students, “Do not depart from deceptions and errors; for they of themselves are the nature of True Reality” (section 27). Later when on the point of death, he takes his closest disciples to task for their ignorance by saying, “All of you sit down. I shall give you a verse, the verse of the true-false moving-quiet.” (section 48) There is something very tricky in such sayings, as they are seemingly contradictory if not absurd. The point of a paradox, of course, is that such absurdity is only apparent for the paradox masks a higher truth that we must divine ourselves. As such, paradox is a highly suggestive form of rhetoric, one that presents us with a basic tension, leaving it for us to resolve.

Huineng also engages in a great deal of polemics in the Platform Sutra. For example, he continually contrasts the “wise” with the “deluded.” He also draws a sharp contrast between his teachings and those of the “Northern school” (secs. 37, 39, 48-49), criticizes a student whose “practice” consists of only reciting the Lotus Sutra (sec. 42), and even converts a “spy” who seems to have come to discredit him (secs. 40-41). While a polemical style may have negative connotations it also serves several rhetorical purposes. To begin, it sets the Master and his audience apart from others, thereby emphasizing that this teaching is different or special. It also underscores the challenging nature of the teaching, and no doubt directly counters various preconceived ideas in the audience. Indeed, it may even put his disciples and audience on the defensive, thus setting them up psychologically for a deeper breakthrough.

All in all, Huineng’s teaching style is quite challenging. At times it is highly provocative, even maddening. He does not lay his subjects out neatly so that his audience can absorb what he says with ease but jars his listeners to elicit a reaction from them. His words, thus, are inherently unstable and elusive, pouring forth quixotically. They resist final definition and closure, similar to Zhuangzi’s “goblet words” (zhi yan, cf. Zhuangzi chapter 27) or what the fifth century Buddhist thinker Sengzhao terms “wild words” (kuan yan, cf. his essay “Panruo Wuzhi”). Such stylistic considerations, in the end, suggest that the ultimate message of Huineng’s sermon may not be so much what he says as how he says it and how we take up his words in our response.

5. Influences

As noted above, Huineng himself claims that nothing in his teachings originates with him, much as Confucius does in Analects 15.28. Clearly, what he iterates in the Platform Sutra derives from earlier works and there are many times when he makes explicit references to other texts, notably the Diamond, Vimalakirti, and Lotus Sutras. In addition, we should also mention the Nirvana Sutra, a text promoting the universality of the “Buddha-nature” that had a profound influence on Chinese Buddhism as a whole. The influences, however, go far beyond this short list. Huineng demonstrates knowledge of the great body of Prajna-paramita (Perfection of Wisdom) literature (of which the Diamond Sutra is one rather late example), as well as the techniques of the Madhyamika school – notably in the negation of set positions, dialectic play between “conventional” and “Ultimate” truth, and the constant challenge to any attempts at a final articulation of Buddhist truth. In addition, at certain points he reveals a basic familiarity with Pure Land doctrine (sec. 35) and some rather technical aspects of Abhidharma and Yogacara philosophy (sec. 45)

Moreover, Huineng’s teachings and style of presentation also owe a great deal to indigenous Chinese sources. This is most obvious when it comes to Daoism, as Huineng’s character and actions so often epitomize teachings found in both the Daode jing and the Zhuangzi. As for Confucian tradition, Huineng makes an obvious bow to Confucius in presenting himself as a transmitter, while his adherence to the positive power of “Buddha nature” owes at least something to the Mencian idea of “inherent goodness” of human nature, a perennial theme in Chinese philosophy that finds one of its most popular articulations in the Zhongyong (“Doctrine of the Mean”). Other scholars have even suggested that portions of the Platform Sutra may have been compiled under the influence of the Yijing.

The fact that Huineng quotes passages from such a large body of works and that scholars can so-easily discern other literary influences and allusions constitutes further proof that the tradition of Huineng’s illiteracy should not be taken literally. In the Platform Sutra Huineng proves rather erudite, if not bookish. His familiarity with so much of his Buddhist and Chinese heritage challenges stereotypes of Chan as denigrating and even ignoring written texts. Indeed, scholars of Buddhism often point out the ironic fact that Chan, so often known for its dismissal of texts, has the largest body of written work of any East Asian Buddhist tradition. Furthermore, many great Chan masters (for example, Dogen, 1200-1253) were brilliant scholars and original thinkers. This paradoxical aspect of Chan, rather than being the product of centuries of institutionalization as some might claim, seems to have been there from the very beginning.

6. Critical Issues

Although the Platform Sutra is most unusual for a “philosophical” text, both in terms of style and content it raises a number of issues that are of particular philosophic import.

a. The Role of Reason and Rationality

Chan has a reputation for irrationality, allegedly insisting that practitioners cut off thinking entirely. There is some basis for such views, and in Chan history we do find examples where this seems to have been encouraged, as, for example, in the case of the Baotang school of Chan that developed in Sichuan during eighth century. Huineng and most Chan masters, however, do not advocate a disorderly or irrational lifestyle. Their concern, instead, seems to be on the predominance of ratio (deliberative, analytic thinking) and the discursive reasoning that severs aspects of reality into discrete bits, usually from an egocentric standpoint. From a Chan perspective, this mode of understanding is the result of a highly artificial process that cuts one off from full participation in one’s immediate context and inevitably leads to suffering. Such an approach cannot be countered with rational, objective arguments because such reasoning is itself a product of such a mode of understanding. By breaking the grip of such processes on humanity, Huineng and his later followers seek to free us for a fuller, more natural life, and hence a truer life.

Much of the difficulty surrounding this subject stems from Chan’s distinctive rhetorical style, of which Huineng is a true master. In particular the notion of “no-thought” seems to suggest a sort of mindless, purely instinctual response or perhaps even unconsciousness. Certainly, “no-thought” is not rational in the sense of bare objectivity. In fact, as we have seen, “no-thought” is not this at all but more like an attitude of carefully attentiveness to the situation at hand. If “no-thought” is lacking in anything it would be the self-consciousness that typically arises out of the dualism inherent in subject-object thinking. Most assuredly “no-thought” should not be equated with becoming insentient, that is, an “object” among others.

Is there a place for reason in all this? Not in the ordinary sense. However, Chan would seem to be less “irrational” than “a rational,” although such labels themselves are designations arising within discursive reasoning. In the end, it may be helpful to view Huineng as espousing a type of “philosophy as propaganda,” much like Nagarjuna or the later Wittgenstein. The aim is not to argue but to change one’s way of thinking in favor of a more immediate and direct way of being.

b. Sudden vs. Gradual?

Much has been made of this notion in Chan scholarship and, indeed, Chan tradition often presents the as a conflict of “Northern Chan Gradualism” and “Southern Chan Subitism” – an alleged conflict from which the latter emerged victorious. In reality it is not really so simple, but the contrast points to an instable dynamic that lies at the heart of Buddhism and perhaps all spiritual practice. If “sudden awakening” refers to an instantaneous experience of enlightenment at which point nothing more needs to be done, then why did someone like Huineng continue to sit in meditation through his later years and exhort his students to do the same even after his death (section 53)?

In fact, what Huineng says about the contrast between “sudden” and “gradual” is anything but clear: “Good friends, in the dharma there is no sudden or gradual, but among people some are keen and others dull. The deluded recommend the gradual method, the enlightened practice the sudden teaching. . . Once enlightened, there is from the outset no distinction between these two methods; those who are not enlightened with for long kalpas be caught in the cycle of transmigration” (section 16). In part it appears that the distinction between “sudden” and “gradual” is a provisional one made from the unawakened standpoint that applies to Chan practitioners rather than the actual event of awakening itself. Yet can one move from delusion to enlightenment, from gradual to sudden? It also seems that the difference between “sudden” and “gradual” cannot refer to a temporal distinction, for even a “sudden awakening” certainly cannot be attained easily or without much practice; Huineng had several “sudden awakenings” but devoted himself to a lifetime of Chan practice.

Later Chan thinkers such as Zongmi (a.k.a. Guifeng, 780-841) were deeply concerned about these notions and sought to clarify them by speaking of “sudden awakening followed by gradual cultivation.” While intriguing, such a solution essentially erases any ultimate meaning to the sudden/gradual distinction. It also implies that claims to “sudden awakening” by Huineng and his followers line were rhetorical rather than genuine.

c. The Role of Text (wen) in Life

The reputation of Chan as eschewing textual study has long been a source of controversy and great appeal. We can see this even in the “Chan motto” attributed to Bodhidharma in which the dharma is said to be a “separate transmission outside the scriptures, not relying on words and letters.” There can be no arguing that Chan presents a basic distrust of scholasticism that seems to have characterized the Chinese doctrinal schools such as Tiantai and Huayan. But does this mean that texts have no place? This would hardly seem to be warranted given what we find in the Platform Sutra. In the autobiographical portions of the Sutra Huineng has his initial awakening from hearing a text (the Diamond Sutra), demonstrates his worth through his own “dharma verse,” and received official dharma transmission through verbal teachings from Hongren. Moreover, Huineng’s sermon is full of instances in which he unfolds the various meanings in a number of Buddhist texts. In addition, there are several passages in which Huineng draws attention to the text of his sermon itself, stating “If others are able to encounter the Platform Sutra, it will be as if they received the teaching personally from me” (section 47). The text goes on to note that Huineng’s closest disciples received his teaching, made copies of the Platform Sutra and entrusted them to later generations, all of whom were led through it to see into their own true natures.

An important clue for our understanding can be found when Huineng is preparing to give his “death verse.” Before launching into his final teaching he tells his disciples, “if you understand its meaning, you will be the same as I” (section 48). Like Sakyamuni before his passing, Huineng promises that that the master will remain with his students in the form of his teachings. These teachings, compiled in textual form, will have the power to lead hearers and readers to realization of their True natures once they grasp the teachings’ true import. In this reading, the Master’s role is open up the teachings via his own words (or actions) and so manifest their meaning; the crucial point is that these are transmitted by the Master and taken up by the students – a process that can only happen “outside the scriptures” themselves. There is an interesting parallel here to the view of the Neo-Confucian master Zhu Xi, who, in outlining the regimen of study for his disciples, emphasizes the importance of texts as a coming into the very presence of the Sages themselves.

The conclusion seems to be that Huineng does not denigrate texts per se, for they were instrumental in his own awakening and play a central role in his sermons. Instead, he (and later Chan tradition) attacks the tendency to treat them objectively, as material to be mastered rather than dharma gates leading to awakening. Ego, cutting off from full involvement in the world. Taking texts truly as “scripture,” however, is another matter. The words of dharma are Buddha in that they allow us to perceive truth. In this view, then, those passages in the Platform Sutra calling attention to the text itself emphasize its way of connecting one with Huineng’s wisdom offered for our awakening. What we see then is that through Huineng, Chan celebrates the centrality of text, but as “live word” internalized and acted upon rather than mere marks on the page. Such an existential engagement, however, is not typically found in the modern study of philosophy and so raises questions about what “philosophy” may actually be.

d. The Relation of Action (praxis) and Knowledge (theoria)

The centrality of practice is a major refrain in Huineng’s discourse. Despite his often-cryptic comments, the Master shares the decidedly practical focus that runs through much of Chinese philosophic culture. Time and time again, Huineng exhorts us to a life of Chan action and practice, a life of Buddhahood, rather than quietistic withdrawal. Although clearly there is some sort of “theory” informing Huineng (a sinified version of tathagatha-garbha teachings), this never takes precedence over practical application. In fact, Huineng (and Chan in general) refuses to distinguish between these two concepts, arguing essentially that true knowing is practical action. Thus, from this perspective nothing can be “true in theory” if it is not borne out in practice.

The priority of praxis is underscored by the fact that Chan is often regarded first and foremost as a “practice school.” In contrast to the doctrinal concerns of the Tiantai and Huayan, Chan emphasizes practices such as “no-thought” while maintaining that getting tangled up in mistaken ideas inevitably leads one astray. Since we are already Buddha, we must realize this through Buddha living. Only then are we awakened to the truth of our original (Buddha) nature.

There are some interesting analogies to Huineng’s perspective that provide much food for thought. Socrates, for example, famously argues that “to know the good is to do the good,” implying that true understanding is always attested in actual life. In a different vein, there is also Martin Heidegger’s existential analysis of dasein in which he focuses on our unreflective “being-in-the-world” as demonstrating a prior unthematized Understanding, that is, our actual (as opposed to theoretical) knowledge of things. Perhaps the most obvious analogy, however, can be found in the work of Wang Yangming (Wang Shouren, 1472-1529). Among his teachings, Wang maintained that knowing and acting formed an essential original unity that people often separate through their own selfish desires. In fact, Wang explained to one of his greatest disciples, “There have never been people who know but do not act. Those who are supposed to know but do not act simply do not know.”

e. The Centrality of Ritual (Li)

This matter has received little attention until recently but is an outgrowth of the general Chinese focus on practice. We have already seen that in the Platform Sutra Huineng constantly preaches to his charges to act upon his teachings, putting them into practice. This preaching, of course, is itself a type of Chan practice and, in fact, occurs within a ritual context and in a temple setting. Giving and listening to a “dharma talk” are both highly ritualized activities that follow their own specified rules. Furthermore, Huineng repeatedly enjoins his followers to chant certain vows aloud and to take various types of precepts. Thus the entire discourse is pervaded by a strong sense of ritual, or li. There is a strong, albeit implicit message here that Huineng is calling for participation in specific activities from all those in his audience, that is, all who hear or read the Platform Sutra.

Adherence to li, of course, has been a primary focus of Chinese culture from the very earliest times, and philosophical discussion of li plays a central role in Chinese thought since at least the time of Confucius. Moreover, li by their very nature are a form of highly regulated activity that require repeated engagement to learn. One learns the li by doing the li. Huineng and the text of the Platform Sutra thus underscore the highly ritualized nature of Chan life, a fact that several scholars have noted and which provides yet another strong contrast to popular (mis)understandings of Chan. Rather than being an incitement to egocentric spontaneity (which would result in utter chaos, and hence more delusion and suffering), the “sudden awakening” espoused by Huineng can only occur within a ritual context in which all parties are actively engaged. Those involved are not “doing their own thing” but participating in a shared activity in which all energies are marshaled in concert. It is just for this reason that Huineng stresses the “samadhi of oneness” and Chan monastic training involves meditation training not just during periods of actual physical sitting but throughout all daily activities.

7. Impact on Later Buddhist and Chinese Philosophical Traditions

Huineng’s impact on Chan is without parallel. Not only did he articulate the major themes that came to dominate Chan discourse and practice, he provided the model of the ideal Master. By the late eighth century, two main branches of Chan existed: the “Northern” and “Southern” schools. Claiming to have studied under Huineng, Shenhui (684-758) launched an attack on the legitimacy of “Northern” Chan, which enjoyed imperial patronage during the Tang dynasty (618-907) under the leadership of Master Shenxiu (ca. 606-706) and his heir, Puji (651-739). Alleging that his teacher was the true recipient of dharma transmission and ridiculing the latter’s “gradualist” approach to awakening, Shenhui insisted that Huineng was the real Sixth Patriarch and claimed the title of Seventh Patriarch for himself. Shenhui’s claims carried the day and by the ninth century, the “Southern” school with its teaching of “sudden awakening” was accepted as the official line. Ironically, both the “Northern” and “Southern” schools eventually died out as direct lineages. It was only later that, having survived the imperial persecutions of 841-845, other Chan schools reasserted their connection(s) to Huineng and so enshrined the tale of unilinear dharma transmission.

The Platform Sutra became wildly popular in China, perhaps because of its paradoxical “Daoist” air, and numerous copies circulated. The traditional version, printed some five hundred years after the oldest version, is almost twice the size of the original due to later additions and expansions. Huineng’s idiosyncratic way of discussing the sutras, less of a strict exegesis and more a performance of their message, a practice known as tichang (Japanese teisho) set the standard for a Chan “dharma talk.” Stories of Huineng are scattered throughout the various gong’an (Japanese koan) collections. Perhaps the most famous of these allegedly comes from Huineng’s confrontation with Huiming, the fierce former general who came to kill him on the mountaintop. As the Huiming approached, the Master asked, “Not thinking of good, not thinking of evil, just at this moment, what is our original face before your mother and father were born?” Huiming at once became enlightened. This koan is still one of the first given to beginning students in Japanese Zen monasteries.

By inaugurating a powerful new approach to the dharma, however, Huineng had impact far beyond Buddhism and Chan. Philosophically, the strongest effect was on Neo-Confucianism, a major response of Confucian tradition to the challenges offered by Buddhism, particularly Chan. Each of the “Five Great Masters” (Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai, Cheng Yi, Cheng Hao, Zhu Xi) studied Chan at some point in their youth, and the records of their discussions with students as well as the anecdotes concerning their lives (collected in such works as Reflections on Things at Hand) strongly resemble later Chan collections such as the Wumen guan (The Gateless Gate). Chan influence on Wang Yangming is so great as to scarcely need comment.

As for Daoism, the most obvious impact Chan had was on the formation of the Quanzhen (“Complete Perfection”) school, a monastic sect that originated in the twelfth century. The Quanzhen sect shows blatant Chan influence, from its code of regulations, meditation techniques, and even the layout of its monastic compounds. The school’s founder, Wang Chongyang (1112-1170), with his cryptic teaching style and insistence on diligent practice at all times, could even be one of Huineng’s disciples.

The portrait of Huineng emerging from Chan tradition and the Platform Sutra in particular is quite compelling. The Master is portrayed as brilliant despite (or because of) his humble beginnings and takes on a truly heroic stature through his trials and eventual triumph. In his statements, Huineng comes across as immensely charismatic. He is by turns insightful, iconoclastic and humorous. Throughout his discourse he challenges his audience to leave behind intellectual preconceptions while undercutting all attempts to grasp his meaning by rational means. Ironically, during this lengthy verbal discourse he proclaims, “the practice of self-awakening does not lie in verbal arguments.” (section 38) This despite offering long harangues against Chan practitioners who have “false views.” Huineng, thus, is the archetypal Chan Master, a model for all later Chan practitioners. We can even see traces of Huineng in the character of Yoda, the great Jedi master from the Star Wars film series. At one point in Episode V: The Empire Strikes Back, Yoda famously tells his disciple Luke Skywalker, “Do, or do not -- there is no ‘try’!” -- a line that could be straight from the Platform Sutra. Truly, Huineng lives on.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Dumoulin, Heinrich. Zen Buddhism: A History. Vol. 1, India and China. New York: Macmillan, 1988.
    • The first in a nearly exhaustive two-volume treatment of the history of Chan/Zen Buddhism (the second volume deals exclusively with Japan). Accessible, detailed, interesting, this is a fine scholarly overview that both beginners and experts will find useful.
  • Faure, Bernard. The Rhetoric of Immediacy: A Cultural Critique of Chan/Zen Buddhism. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1995.
  • Faure, Bernard. The Will to Orthodoxy: A Critical Genealogy of Northern Chan Buddhism. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • Along with Faure’s Ch’an Insights and Oversights (1993), these two works exemplify the detailed, technical studies of Chan/Zen that have emerged during the past two decades. Faure draws heavily on Postmodern figures (Foucault, Derrida) in his powerful, wide-ranging yet insightful critical “unmasking” of traditional understandings of Chan and Zen.
  • Hershock, Peter D. Chan Buddhism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2005.
    • Part of the “Dimensions of Asian Spirituality” series, this may be the finest one volume overview of Chan/Zen available in English. Hershock skillfully steers a “middle way” between critical-historical scholarship and insight into the spiritual meaning of Chan/Zen teachings and practice. An admitted practicing Buddhist for over 20 years, Hershock fleshes out his “Zen Bones” with profiles of Huineng as well as other Chan masters (Bodhidharma, Mazu, and Linji). In the end he presents Chan/Zen as a vital practice that has the potential to help us shed our ego boundaries and open ourselves to our fellow human beings.
  • Hershock, Peter D. Liberating Intimacy: Enlightenment and Social Virtuosity in Ch’an Buddhism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
    • Hershock’s first book on Chan, presenting a unique and insightful philosophical take stressing Chan as a tradition of practice in the world. As the title suggests, Hershock maintains that Chan is a way towards achieving “liberating intimacy” with other sentient beings. A masterful refutation of charges that Chan/Zen is mere self-indulgent “navel gazing” or that it encourages antinomian or immoral behavior.
  • Jorgenson, John. Inventing Hui-neng, the Sixth Patriarch: Hagiography and Biography in Early Ch’an. Leiden: E. J. Brill Academic Publishing, 2005.
    • A recent critical analysis of the Huineng legend and the saga of Early Chan. The author uses the life of Confucius as the model on which Huineng’s biography is based. Very good at showing the influence of Confucianism, politics etc. on early Chan. The cover photo of Huineng’s alleged “mummy” alone is startling.
  • McRae, John R. The Northern School and the Formation of Early Ch’an Buddhism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1986.
    • A major scholarly work drawing heavily on critical Japanese scholarship. McRae was one of the first to truly take on the traditional Chan/Zen story of the “Northern” versus “Southern” school.
  • Price, A.F., and Wong Mou-lam, trans. The Diamond Sutra and the Sutra of Hui-Neng. Boston: Shambhala Publications, Inc., 1990.
    • One of the special “Shambhala Dragon Editions” series, this work presents two of the most important texts in early Chan, and does so from a Chan perspective. While not scholarly by any means (there are very few notes), they definitely capture the iconoclastic spirit of Chan. As if to underscore this, a famous 13th century black ink painting of Huineng tearing up a sutra graces its cover. Wong’s translation of the Platform Sutra was the first ever done into English (in the 1930’s), and for that reason alone it is significant. It includes some episodes not in the Dunhuang version translated by Yampolsky (see below).
  • Suzuki, Daisetz Teitaro. The Zen Doctrine of No-mind: the Significance of the Sutra of Hui-Neng (Wei-Lang). York Beach, ME: Weiser Books, 1972.
    • Originally published in 1969, this is a posthumous work by one of the foremost (and controversial) popularizers of Zen in the West. While perhaps marked by a sort of “weisho quality,” this book demonstrates Suzuki’s awareness of critical scholarship on Chan/Zen tradition and a real understanding of many of the issues involved in Huineng’s “biography” and Zen teachings. Although not a roshi himself, Suzuki was never as much of an “outsider” to the Zen establishment as some of his critics have made him out to be. His personal experience with Zen training sharpened Suzuki’s insights and his comparisons with Christianity are thought provoking at the very least.
  • Yampolsky, Philip B., trans., The Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch (New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • Still the definitive English translation, based upon the Dunhuang manuscript. All quotations in the above are taken from Yampolsky’s translation. Heavily annotated, it includes a lengthy introduction (over 100 pages), glossary, and a critical edition of the Chinese text at the very end. A must read for anyone seeking to understand Chan tradition and its most famous Patriarch.

Author Information

John M. Thompson
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.

Fazang (Fa-tsang, 643—712 C.E.)

The Buddhist ideologue Fazang (Fa-tsang) stands as one of the foremost figures of medieval Chinese Buddhism. He lived at the very pinnacle of Chinese Buddhism among towering figures such as the legendary pilgrim and Yogacara (Faxiang) master Xuanzang (602-664), the Chan patriarch Shenxiu (d. 706) and the great chronicler Daoxuan (596-667). According to Song dynasty biographer Zanning, he was “mysterious and upright, by nature surpassingly clever and sagacious.” For the better part of his life, he worked in close proximity with the highest echelons of imperial power, deeply engaged in matters of court and country. For four decades, under a series of emperors, he served as a lecturer, a translator, a rhetorician, a propagandist, and a miracleworker. Tirelessly, he lectured on the Flower Garland Sutra, translated Buddhist sutras from Sanskrit and Khotanese (a Middle Iranian language once spoken in what is now China’s Xinjiang province) into Chinese, and wrote meticulously crafted commentaries interpreting Buddhist scripture in a manner that served to exalt his imperial patron’s status. Shortly after his death, the emperor Ruizong (r. 684-690, 710-712) praised him effusively: “The late monk Fazang inherited his virtuous karma from the Heavens and his open intelligence accorded with principle. With his eloquence and outstanding understanding, he had his mind interfused with penetrating enlightenment.” He would become known as the third patriarch and systematizer of the Flower Garland (Huayan or Hua-yen) school of Buddhism.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Thought
    1. Shunyata
    2. Bodhicitta
    3. Indra's Net
    4. The Golden Lion
  3. Works
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Secondary Sources
    2. Primary Sources

1. Biography

Fazang was a native of Sogdiana (in Chinese, Sute). This is an Iranian civilization that encompassed territories now incorporated into the modern states of Uzbekistan and Tajikistan in Central Asia. As a youth, he embraced Buddhism with fervent devotion; at sixteen, he burned off one of his fingers as an offering to the Buddha before the Aśokan reliquary in the famous Famen Temple in the Tang dynasty capital of Chang’an. Thereafter, he became a recluse on nearby Mount Taibai, where he encountered masters of the Flower Garland (Avatamsaka) Sutra. Returning to Chang’an to attend to his ailing parents, he encountered Zhiyan (602-668) and became his student and disciple. Fazang was constantly called upon to explicate the profound wonders contained in the Flower Garland Sutra, lecturing to clergy and rulers more than thirty times.

Like many eminent Buddhists, a mystical aura has grown around Fazang in subsequent hagiography. One must investigate with a careful and critical eye the many miracles and legends that surround his person. Some of the purported miracles were closely associated with his oratory prowess. In 689, when he delivered his lecture on the Flower Garland Sutra in Luoyang, a piece of auspicious ice was discovered in which, it is said, an image of “twinned pagodas” appeared. When Śiksānanda and he were translating the Flower Garland Sutra in Luoyang, a hundred-petaled lotus flower blossomed in front of the translation hall. After lectures in 692 and 696, light allegedly issued from Fazang’s mouth, prompting the congregated faithful to marvel. On other occasions, following his lectures, it is said that flowers fell from the heavens and five-colored clouds accumulated in the skies.

Fazang appears to have been a practitioner of esoteric Buddhism, which many East Asian rulers believed commanded magical powers. In 697, the throne requested that he use Buddhist scriptural magic to help defeat the Khitan, a proto-Mongolian ethnic group that once dominated what is now Manchuria. Fazang performed a ritual cleansing, changed clothes, set an eleven-faced image of the bodhisattva (an enlightened being who selflessly seeks to aid others) Guanyin (Kuan-yin) on a ritual platform, and worked his magic. Heavenly drums echoed, the image of Guanyin appeared on high, surveying the countless divine troops who materialized to combat the raiders, inspiring the Zhou forces and plunging the Khitan into despair. This triumph prompted the empress Wu Zhao to exclaim, “This is the blessed aegis of Buddha force!” and change the reign era name to Shengong (“Divine Merit”).

He was also renowned as a conjurer, capable of summoning weather. On multiple occasions, his prayers and rites brought timely rain to alleviate drought. In 687, at the empress’ behest, he prayed for rain, fasting for seven days, until the skies fortuitously opened and drenched the parched ground. Again, in 696, his prayers proved effective in bringing salubrious rain to afflicted Yongzhou. In 702, Fazang invited another monk to pray at Wuzhen Temple in Lantian, which had no spring. After three dawns of reciting sutras, a freshet suddenly jetted forth at Maitreya Pavilion, bringing vernal bounty to the surrounding lands. Under the emperor Zhongzong, when drought struck Chang’an, Fazang prayed and performed Buddhist rites for seven days, finally bringing a downpour. The following year his prayers for rain were successful once again. Under the emperor Ruizong, he relieved drought and snowless winter, his sincere prayers brought down a blizzard.

In spite of his impressive monastic, scholastic, and thaumaturgical credentials, Fazang was no detached ascetic who speculated on matters recondite and metaphysical. Under Wu Zhao (a.k.a. Empress Wu or Wu Zetian, 624-705, r. 690-705), the only female emperor in Chinese history, the Buddhist clergy was politicized as never before. Contending against a Confucian tradition that stridently opposed her assumption of power, Wu Zhao naturally sought validation for her sovereignty in Buddhism. She styled herself in Buddhist terms as a cakravartin (a universal wheel-turning monarch) and a living bodhisattva. A brilliant orator, lecturer, ideologue, rhetorician and translator, Fazang was one of many Buddhist ideologues who helped sanction her sovereignty. He differed from the vast majority of her other Buddhist supporters in that he was an independent-minded and profound thinker who lectured to Wu Zhao, rather than mustering rhetoric for her. The remarkable duration and depth of their mutual commitment also stands out. For better than three decades, beginning when he preached the Flower Garland Sutra on behalf of her recently deceased mother, he applied his abundant talents toward enhancing Wu Zhao’s reputation as a Buddhist ruler.

At a pivotal juncture of Wu Zhao’s political ascent, as part of a grand ceremony early in 689 that anticipated the inauguration of her Zhou dynasty by a single year, she ordered Fazang to convene a dharma assembly and, from an elevated seat, expound upon the Flower Garland Sutra to thousands of Buddhist monks and nuns congregated for the event. When Fazang delivered a lecture at Buddha’s Prophecy Temple in Luoyang in 700 (shortly after the completion of his new translation of the Flower Garland Sutra), the ground of the lecture hall and temple purportedly shook. Rather than interpreting this earthquake in Confucian fashion, as an inauspicious disharmony of the elements, Wu Zhao understood it as a wondrous event, praising Fazang:

Because he has extended the knowledge of the subtle and profound; disseminated wisdom on the mysterious and abstruse, on the first day of translation, I dreamed that sweet dew descended as an auspicious sign. On the morning of the lecture I felt the earth tremor, a miraculous sign. This, then, was the footfall of the Future Buddha, Maitreya, using the mandala as a lucky icon.

This marriage of ideology and power did not end happily. In Wu Zhao’s turn toward Daoist expiatory rites and longevity potions during her final years, Fazang felt a shift in his patron’s imperial favor. In early 705, Fazang transported the sacred finger-bone of the Buddha from Famen Temple to Luoyang, where Wu Zhao placed him in charge of the relic veneration ceremony, which she believed might ameliorate her declining health. In this official capacity, which provided him access to her person and to the Forbidden City, Fazang worked in tandem with conspirators from the court and betrayed his longstanding patron Wu Zhao, supporting the coup that removed her in 705. A political opportunist, he continued to promote Flower Garland Buddhism serving under emperors Zhongzong (r. 684, 705-710), Ruizong, and Xuanzong (r. 712-756). Curiously, his treachery, to no small extent, saved Buddhism from being identified as a rogue ideology used to validate one whom the Confucian establishment styled an illegitimate female usurper.

Fazang’s successful promotion and propagation of Flower Garland Buddhism under successive rulers played an important role in the subsequent spread, development and Sinification of the school. Over a period of three decades, Fazang played a leading role in these cooperative efforts among the corps of Indian, Khotanese, Sogdian, Korean and Chinese writing translations and commentaries on Buddhist sutras. In Fazang’s epistolary correspondence with Korean Flower Garland monk Ŭisang, another disciple of his master Zhiyan, it is apparent that he attempted to propagate a worldwide state without barriers, an infinite realm linked by the Mahayana Buddhist faith. Fazang also taught another Korean monk, Shimsang, who helped transmit Chinese Flower Garland Buddhism to Japan. Ultimately, these contacts helped propagate Flower Garland Buddhism, linking it to a wider pan-Asian network

2. Thought

a. Shunyata

At the very heart of Flower Garland Buddhism is the idea of what is known in Sanskrit as shunyata (“emptiness”): universal interconnectedness, all-inclusiveness, intercausality and interpenetration. Fazang did a great deal to elevate Flower Garland Buddhism over rival schools, acknowledging other Buddhist schools and sutras, but championing the Flower Garland Sutra as the central teaching of the Buddha. As the Buddha’s first sermon upon attaining enlightenment, the nearly incomprehensible Flower Garland Sutra was invested with a profundity and wisdom unequalled in the Buddha’s subsequent works. In this effort, Fazang gathered and classified the rather unsystematic and wide-ranging Buddhist teachings into five categories in order of ascending profundity and power. In ascending order: Hinayana, Initial Mahayana, Final Mahayana, Sudden Teaching of the One Vehicle (proto-Zen), and, at the pinnacle, the Comprehensive Teaching of the One Vehicle—in essence, the Flower Garland Sutra. The sense of universality allowed the Flower Garland School to be compatible with other sects, effectively encompassing their doctrine, while maintaining the overarching primacy of the Flower Garland teachings.

b. Bodhicitta

This doctrine of interdependence is also reflected in Fazang’s thoughts on bodhicitta (mental dedication to helping all sentient beings and attaining enlightenment). Following the logic that each element pervades all that exists and itself contains all other elements in the phenomenal world, “In practicing the virtues, when one is perfected, all are perfected,” he writes, “and when one first arouses the thought of enlightenment one also becomes perfectly enlightened” (trans. Wright). Fazang’s emphasis on the omniversal generative power of the tathagatagarbha, the “womb of Buddhahood,” while not unique, subsequently developed into an important concept in the East Asian Mahayana Buddhist tradition.

So that others might better comprehend the profound doctrine of the Flower Garland Sutra, Fazang used the metaphor of the Ten Mysteries (Ten Mysterious Gates) to explicate the interconnectedness and inter-causality in the Flower Garland universe. These Ten Mysteries illustrate how seemingly contradictory pairs—the hidden and the manifest, truth and falsehood, the infinite and the infinitesimal, the general and the specific--mutually complement each other and coexist without obstruction. Indra’s net (see below) is one of the Ten Mysteries.

Fazang’s ideas of an interconnected omniverse extended easily and effectively from the metaphysical realm to the political arena. Indeed, it allowed Wu Zhao to serve as the alpha link in a cosmic concatenation. Stanley Weinstein has commented “Seeing herself as a universal monarch, she must have been attracted by the Flower Garland school with its well-ordered universe presided over by Vairocana Buddha, whose every act was reflected in countless worlds.” This integrated and totalistic vision of the cosmos was “analogous to the highly centralized imperial state that she ruled.” This ideology allowed Wu Zhao to portray herself as an absolute sovereign, all-pervasive and omnipresent. This central idea of the boundless reach of the Buddha’s power and compassion, nicely paralleled and supported the idea of the infinite compass of the ruler’s authority and benevolence. Fazang’s creative presentation and flair for theater (see below), both enhanced the great aesthetic, intellectual and philosophical appeal of his ideas and made them more comprehensible. In Wu Zhao, he found a potential cakravartin to propagate the Buddhist faith; in Fazang’s profound thought, she, in turn, discovered powerful ideological justification for her authority.

c. Indra's Net

When Fazang first lectured on the Flower Garland Sutra, the principles he expounded upon were so abstruse that the listeners were utterly dumbstruck. Therefore, to render the sutra comprehensible to his imperial patrons and to the masses of Buddhist faithful, he used metaphors such as Indra’s Net of Jewels and the Golden Lion. In the former, “In each of the jewels, the images of all the other jewels are reflected...the images multiply infinitely, and all these multiple images are bright and clear within a single jewel.” This concatenation, this mutual linking and inter-penetration, illustrates harmonious interconnectedness of everything. Here, causal sky net objects can not be conceived of independently: the nature of each object is defined by its place with relation to all other objects. He also devised a Hall of Mirrors to illustrate the workings of Indra’s Net and the power of the Buddha by arranging ten mirrors (corresponding with the Ten Mysterious Gates), eight in an octagon, one above and one below, with a statue of the Buddha set in the middle, the focal point of origin and return. When he lit a torch to illumine the centerpiece, an endless web of reflected light crisscrossed, creating an infinite series of images within images, each containing the entire Buddha. This demonstration made manifest the meaning of the inexhaustible interconnectedness of the universe, hence the infinite power of the Buddha.

d. The Golden Lion

Fazang’s most famous device of performative metaphor was a lion made of gold. The lion represents the cosmos, parts of the lion the various phenomena of the universe, while the gold represented emptiness. The lion had a mane, teeth, claws and eyes: parts that seemed distinct and unrelated. And yet the essential substance of the entire lion was the same--gold. Within each hair, paradoxically, there are infinite lions. The differences are all superficial. Such is the nature of the integrated, interconnected Flower Garland universe. After demonstrating this principle to Wu Zhao using the sculpture of a lion at the imperial palace gate around 700 (sources differ), Fazang wrote a one-chapter Essay on the Golden Lion.

In his Treatise on the Five Teachings, a house is used as a metaphor for the universe. The complex interplay between joists, uprights, roof, tenons and mortises—the sum total of structural relationships between all parts--is contained in a single rafter. The nature of the infinite can be seen in the infinitesimal. The role of the rafter--or any other component--helps one understand the interdependence of all sentient beings. Certainly, Fazang’s flair for the theatrical and his ability to convey the message to his patrons through such brilliant demonstrations, helped successfully propagate Flower Garland Buddhism.

3. Works

Much of Fazang’s energy was devoted to exegetical work on and demonstrations of the Flower Garland Sutra. He produced more than sixty original works, commentaries on a wide variety of Buddhist texts, and meditation manuals, and participated in many Buddhist translation projects. Collectively, Fazang’s works and translations must be looked at not only in terms of their metaphysical and ideological merit, but as political rhetoric consciously geared toward promoting the Flower Garland school and exalting the sovereignty of his imperial sponsors. Fazang’s Treatise on the Five Teachings detailed a hierarchy of Buddhist sects, placing, of course, Flower Garland at the apex and clarifying common ideological ground.

Fazang was a propagandist. His Huayanjing zhuanji, a commentary he wrote between 690 and 693, helped provide legitimacy for Wu Zhao’s claim to be a cakravartin. Making reference to her titles as “Sage Mother” and “Divine Sovereign,” Fazang remarked, “Both sage and divine, she makes the Six Supernatural Penetrations act without stopping; infinitely good and infinitely beautiful, she displays the Ten Goodnesses beyond all limits.”

For Wu Zhao, retranslating and reinterpreting the Flower Garland Sutra was an ongoing, high-priority political activity. Fazang played a pivotal role in this effort. The Flower Garland Sutra was at the heart of a deep-rooted and longstanding Khotanese tradition of Buddhist kingship, with a Chinese lineage going from ruler Shi Hu of the Eastern Jin in the 4th century to Liang Wudi to Sui Wendi and finally to Wu Zhao. She sent emissaries to Khotan to seek the Sanskrit version of the Flower Garland Sutra. In 679, the Indian monk Divākara presented newly recovered Sanskrit sutras at Gaozong’s court. In 684, with Divākara, Fazang worked on a translation of the Flower Garland Sutra at Western Taiyuan Temple. As preparatory work for the compilation of the new Flower Garland Sutra, Fazang compared these new texts to extant translations, noting disparities and incorporating omissions. Between 695 and 699, she recruited Khotanese monks such as Śiksānanda and Devaprajña to work in tandem with Fazang, completing a new, improved Flower Garland Sutra that was eighty chapters instead of sixty. This new Flower Garland Sutra superseded the version completed in the 680s and helped confirm Wu Zhao’s identification as a cakravartin and a bodhisattva.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Secondary Sources

  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Pages 406–424 include a brief survey of Flower Garland school thought and a full translation of the “Golden Lion Essay.”
  • Chen, Jinhua. Monks and Monarchs, Kinship and Kingship: Tanqian in Sui Buddhism and Politics. Italian School of East Asian Studies Essays Series, vol. 3. Kyoto: Scuola Italiana di Studi sull’Asia Orientale, 2002.
  • Chen, Jinhua. “More Than a Philosopher: Fazang (643-712) as a Politician and Miracle-worker.” History of Religions 42.4 (May 2003): 320-358.
  • Cook, Francis. Hua-yen Buddhism: The Jewel Net of Indra. Penn State University Press, 1977.
  • DeBary, Wm. Th., et al, eds. Sources of Chinese Tradition, Vol I., 2nd ed. Columbia University Press, 1999.
  • Pp. 471-476 includes sections from the Flower Garland Sutra such as “The Tower of Vairocana” and “Indra’s Net.”
  • Fang, Litian. Huayan jin shizi zhang jiaoshi, Zhongguo Fojiao dianji xuankan. Zhonghua, 1996.
  • Forte, Antonino. A Jewel in Indra’s Net: The Letter Sent by Fazang in China to Ŭisang in Korea. Italian School of East Asian Studies Occasional Papers 8. Kyoto, 2000.
  • Forte, Antonino. Mingtang and Buddhist Utopias in the History of the Astronomical Clock: The Tower, the Statue and the Armillary Sphere Constructed by Empress Wu. Rome, 1988. See pp. 121-122.
  • Forte, Antonino. Political Propaganda and Ideology in China at the End of the Seventh Century. Naples, 1977.
  • Fox, Alan. “Fazang.” Great Thinkers of the Eastern World, ed. Ian P. McGreal (HarperCollins, 1995), 99-103.
  • Gu, Zhengmei. “Wu Zetian de Huayan jing: Fowang chuantong yu fowang xingxiang.” Guoxue yanjiu 7 (2000): 279-321.
  • Liu, Ming-Wood. “The Harmonious Universe of Fa-tsang and Leibniz.” Philosophy East and West 32 (1982): 61-76.
  • Rothschild, Norman H. Sub-chapter “Fazang” in “Rhetoric, Ritual and Support Constituencies in the Political Authority of Wu Zhao, Woman Emperor of China.” Ph.D. dissertation, Brown University, 2003.
  • Weinstein, Stanley. “Imperial Patronage in T’ang Buddhism.” Perspectives on the T’ang, eds. Arthur F. Wright and Denis C. Pritchett (Yale University Press, 1973), 265-306.
  • Weinstein, Stanley. Buddhism in T’ang China. Cambridge University Press, 1987.
  • Wright, Dale. “The ‘Thought of Enlightenment’ In Fa-tsang’s Hua-yen Buddhism.” The Eastern Buddhist (Fall 2001): 97-106.

b. Primary Sources

  • Ch’oe Ch’iwŏn (Cui Zhiyuan), Da Tang Jianfusi gu shu fanjing dade Fazang heshang zhuan, (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2054).
    • Biography.
  • Daoxuan, Xu Gaoseng zhuan (Biographies of Eminent Monks), Taisho Triptika, vol. 50, no. 2060.
    • Biography.
  • Fazang, Dasheng qixinlun yiji, Taisho Tripitika vol. 44, no. 1846.
  • Fazang, Fanwang jing pusa jieben shu, Taisho Tripitika vol. 40, no. 1813.
    • Commentary on Brahmajala sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing tanxuan ji (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 35, no. 1733).
    • Commentary on the profundities of the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayan jing wenyi gangmu, Taisho Tripitika, vol 35, no. 1734.
    • Explicates the ten mysterious gates (Ten Mysteries) from the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing zhigui (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 45, no. 1871).
    • Commentary on the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing zhuanji (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 51, no. 2073).
    • Propaganda supporting Wu Zhao’s sovereignty written between 690 and 693.
  • Fazang, Huayan Wujiao zhang (Treatise of the Five Teachings), Taisho Tripitika, vol. 45, no, 1866.
    • Central work that classifies Buddhist teachings and situates the Flower Garland Sutra at the apex.
  • Fazang, Jin shizi zhang, (Essay on the Golden Lion), Taisho Tripitika vol. 45, no. 1881.
  • Yan Chaoyin, “Da Tang Jianfusi gu dade Kangzang fashi zhi bei,” Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2054.
    • Funerary epitaph.
  • Zanning, Song Gaoseng zhuan, Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2061.
  • Zhipan, Fozu tongji, Taisho Tripitika vol. 49, no. 2035.
    • Biography is fascicle 29 of this Southern Song dynasty (1127-1279) work.

Author Information

Norman Harry Rothschild
University of North Florida
U. S. A.

Yang Xiong (53 B.C.E.—18 C.E.)

Yang_XiongYang Xiong (Yang Hsiung) was a prolific yet reclusive court poet whose writings and tragic life spanned the collapse of the Former Han dynasty (202 B.C.E.-9 C.E.) and the brief and catastrophic usurpation of the throne by the Imperial Regent Wang Mang (9-23 C.E.). He is best known for his assertion that human nature originally is neither good (as argued by Mencius) nor depraved (as argued by Xunzi) but rather comes into existence as a mixture of both. Yang Xiong’s chief philosophical writings - an abstruse book of divination known as the Tai xuan (The Great Dark Mystery) and his Fa yan (Words to Live By), a collection of aphorisms and dialogues on a variety of historical and philosophical topics - are little known even among Chinese scholars. These works combine a Daoist concern for cosmology, but may be best described as a product of the intellectual and spiritual syncretism characteristic of the Han dynasty (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.). As a social critic and classical scholar, he is considered to be the chief representative of the Old Text School (guxue) of Confucianism. Although some think he was one of the most important writers of the late Former Han, he had little influence during his own time and was vilified for his association with the usurper Wang Mang. Consequently, his works have largely been left out of the Confucian canon.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Writings
  2. Intellectual Context
    1. Han Syncretism and Correlative Cosmology
    2. The Old Text / New Text Controversy
  3. Tai xuan (The Great Dark Mystery)
    1. Date and Significance
    2. The Influence of the Laozi and the Yijing
    3. Correlative Cosmology in the Tai xuan
  4. Fa yan (Words to Live By)
    1. Date and Significance
    2. The Influence of the Lunyu
    3. Syncretism in the Fa yan
    4. Old Text Themes in the Fa yan
    5. Political Philosophy in the Fa yan
    6. View of Human Nature
  5. Poetical Works
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Writings

Yang Xiong was born in 53 B.C.E. in the western city of Chengdu in the province of Shu. His biography in the Qian Han Shu (History of the Former Han) remarks that Yang Xiong was fond of learning, was unconcerned with wealth, office, and reputation, and suffered from a speech impediment and consequently spoke little. As a youth he probably was a student of Zhuang Zun, a reclusive marketplace fortune teller who refused to take office, opting instead to use divination and fortune-telling as a means to encourage virtue among the common people. Before coming to the capital he gained renown for his poetic writings, in particular for his fu, a poetic genre associated with an earlier native of Shu, Sima Xiangru (179-117 B.C.E.). Yang Xiong’s reputation as a poet eventually reached the capital of Chang’an, and around 20 B.C.E. he was summoned to the court of Emperor Cheng. Between the years 14-10 B.C.E., Yang Xiong submitted several poetic pieces commemorating imperial sacrifices and hunts, and finally in 10 B.C.E. he was appointed to the humble office of “Gentleman in Attendance” and “Servitor at the Yellow Gate,” where he would remain until his final days. While not much is known of Yang Xiong’s activities as a lowly official at the Han court, it appears that, as far back as 9 B.C.E., Emperor Cheng issued a decree excusing him from the direct official service, while maintaining an official title, salary, and access to the imperial library for him.

Shortly after his appointment, Yang Xiong became disillusioned with the rectifying power of his poetry and stopped writing it for the court. Yang Xiong’s decision appears to have coincided with the death of his son, a tragedy which left him despondent and financially impoverished. Over the next two decades he produced his two works on philology: Cang Jie xun zuan (Annotations to the Cang Jie), a compilation of annotations to the Qin dynasty’s official imperial dictionary, and Fang yan (Dialects), a collection of regional expressions. During this period, he also produced his Tai xuan (The Great Dark Mystery), which he completed around 2 B.C.E., and Fa yan (Words to Live By), which he completed in 9 CE – right about the time that the Imperial Regent Wang Mang usurped the throne and established the brief Xin dynasty (9-23 CE).

Yang Xiong’s life and writings were overshadowed by the rise and fall of the notorious Wang Mang (45 B.C.E.-23 CE). A nephew of the wife of Emperor Yuan (who reigned 48-32 B.C.E.), Wang Mang rose to the rank of Imperial Regent. In 9 CE, through a combination of court intrigue, political machinations, manipulation of popular superstitions, and opportunity, he seized the throne from the founding House of Liu and declared himself the rightful possessor of the Mandate of Heaven. His short-lived Xin dynasty marks the dividing line between the Former or Western Han (202 B.C.E.-9 C.E.) and the Later or Eastern Han (25-220 CE) and, due to widespread rebellion and a series of natural catastrophes, is widely considered one of the most calamitous periods in Chinese history.

While little is known of Yang Xiong’s activities during his final years, his biography notes that, shortly after Wang Mang’s usurpation Yang Xiong attempted suicide when he was named in a scandal involving one of his former students. He survived the attempt. When Wang Mang heard of it, he ordered all charges against Yang Xiong dropped, proclaiming that the poet had never been involved in any political affairs at court. His final work, Ju qin mei xin, appears to have been a controversial memorial presented to Wang Mang around 14 CE; its title is translated by Knechtges as Denigrating Qin and Praising Xin. Yang Xiong died four years later at the age of 71.

2. Intellectual Context

a. Han Syncretism and Correlative Cosmology

The focus of Yang Xiong’s writings during the middle years of his life is commonly seen as reflecting the Han trend toward syncretism and correlative cosmology. While the disunity of the Warring States period (475-221 B.C.E.) provided fertile soil for the flourishing of the “One Hundred Schools of Thought” (baijia), the unification brought about by the Qin (221-206 B.C.E.) and the Former Han dynasties provided the impetus for their coalescence. This combination of diverse views during the Qin and the Han periods can be seen in works such as the Lushi chunqiu (The Spring and Autumn Annals of Mr. Lu) and the Huainanzi (The Master of Huainan), which blend various streams of ancient Chinese thought, including Daoism, Confucianism, Legalism, Huang-Lao thought, Militarism, Mohism, and yinyang and wuxing (Five Phase) thought.

Though Confucianism became the dominant and official school of thought in the Han, it borrowed heavily from earlier schools, particularly the yinyang and wuxing schools. The former explains all entities and events in terms of the interaction between two interdependent properties, yin (associated with darkness, passivity, and femininity) and yang (associated with light, activity, and masculinity). The latter takes a similar approach to understanding natural phenomena but includes the idea that “Five Phases” (each associated with metal, wood, water, fire, and earth, respectively) succeed one another in a never-ending cyclical process. The amalgamation of Confucianism, yinyang, and wuxing theory is especially evident in the writings of the scholar Dong Zhongshu (179-104 B.C.E.), whose Chunqiu fanlu (Luxuriant Dew of the Spring and Autumn Annals) illustrates a synthesis between Confucian ethics and an amalgam of yinyang and wuxing cosmology. Attempts to develop exhaustive systems of classification (leishu) were also common during this period and can be seen as part of the larger trend toward syncretization. These tables often use a Five Phase cosmological framework in which things are organized analogically on the basis of their relevant associations, rather than on the basis of some discrete essence. As can be seen in Yang Xiong’s Tai xuan, the correlations which form the basis of these classification systems can be bewildering - especially to anyone unfamiliar with the sorts of complex associations found in early Chinese culture.

b. The Old Text / New Text Controversy

Many historians of Chinese philosophy have identified Yang Xiong’s final and best-known work, the Fa yan (Words to Live By), as representative of a more rational and sober-minded form of Confucianism known as the Old Text School (guxue). In contrast to the New Text School, which relied on versions of the classics written in the simpler and officially recognized script of the Han dynasty known as “new script” (jinwen), the Old Text School relied on versions written in the archaic scripts (guwen) and characters of the Zhou dynasty (c. 1100-221 B.C.E.). Legend has it that these latter texts survived the book burnings of the Qin dynasty by lying concealed in the walls of the home of Confucius. Generally speaking, the Old Text School was associated with the simpler, more pragmatic philosophy of Confucius’s native state of Lu, while the New Text school was associated with the often fantastic writings of Zou Yan (305-240 B.C.E.), a native of Qi and founder of the yinyang and wuxing schools of thought.

Through much of the late Former Han dynasty, Confucianism was under the influence of the yinyang and wuxing theories promoted by New Text adherents. During this period, New Text scholars increasingly became interested in esoteric readings of the classics, cosmological speculation, and calamity and portent interpretation. The chief representatives of this period were classical scholars who commonly employed wuxing and yinyang correlations, numerical calculations, and various techniques of divination to fathom the harmony and continuity of humanity, nature, and the ancestral spirits - and to forecast disruptions.

By the reigns of the last Former Han Emperors, the use of yinyang and wuxing theory in interpreting the classics and the progress of history closely paralleled methods found in apocryphal oracle books and commentaries that treated the classics as fortune-telling handbooks and used reports of unusual phenomena not to boldly admonish the Emperor - as did Zou Yan and Dong Zhongshu - but to curry favor with those in power. This trend reached its climax with Wang Mang, whose rise to power and eventual usurpation was associated with, and to a large extent legitimated by, hundreds of favorable omens and the generous rewarding of those who reported them.

While scholars are divided on whether the Old Text School originated from Xunzi’s branch of Confucianism, most characterize this movement as a rational response to the excesses of the New Text school, whose influence had left the Han court and its scholars heavily dependent upon yinyang and wuxing thinking. More broadly, the Old Text school can be seen as a response to the often irrational and superstitious world of the late Former Han - a world that interpreted the classics as containing secret magical formulas and prognostications, was fascinated by talk of immortals, saw itself near the bottom in the historical cycle of rise and decline, and interpreted the passing of each childless Emperor and reports of calamities as portents to be dreaded.

3. Tai xuan (The Great Dark Mystery)

a. Date and Significance

Completed around 2 B.C.E., the Tai xuan is Yang Xiong’s longest and most difficult work. Few scholars have taken time to study it, and those who have often disagree about its import. Some scholars view the main focus of the text to be wuxing theory, others view its main focus to be the Five Constant Virtues (wuchang) of Confucianism, and still others view the Tai xuan as political satire of Wang Mang and other historical figures of the late Former Han. (See Michael Nylan’s translation and commentary of the Tai Xuan (1993)). While the Tai xuan is more a manual of divination than a philosophical treatise, it embodies a number of assumptions about the nature of the world, its cycles of transformation, and the central importance of timeliness in making one’s way in the world. Just as in his earlier poetry, in the Tai xuan Yang Xiong reiterates the view that success and failure do not all come down to individual effort but have much to do with the times and circumstances in which one lives, and that if one does not meet one’s proper time for acting, then one should retire or withdraw and wait for more advantageous times.

b. The Influence of the Laozi and the Yijing

The term xuan in the title is typically used in Chinese literature as a modifier to describe that which is dark, black, mysterious, profound, abstruse or hidden. Yang Xiong, however, uses the term xuan much like the term dao in the Laozi to refer to the hidden fountainhead or initial state out of which things emerge and the mysterious process through which they unfold. While Yang Xiong’s conception of xuan seems to be derived from the Laozi, the text of the Tai xuan is modeled on the Yijing (Book of Changes), certainly the most enigmatic philosophical document in early Chinese literature. Like the Yijing, the Tai xuan is a book of divination based on an evolving sequence of figures that, when taken together, map out the cycles of transformation underlying all things. In both texts, each figure-image-circumstance is articulated through an evolving series of statements that describes and appraises the unfolding of the situation and the meaning of the image. Appended to both the Yijing and the Tai xuan is a set of commentaries that elaborates on the inner meanings of their respective texts.

In some ways, the Tai xuan is even more complex than its model. While the Yijing is made up of 64 hexagrams, the Tai xuan is made up of 81 tetragrams. In the Yijing, each hexagram line can be solid or broken (representing the polarities of yin and yang). In the Tai xuan, each tetragram line can be solid, broken once, or broken twice (representing the triad of heaven, earth, and man), and each of the 81 tetragrams is correlated with, among other things, yin or yang, one of the “Five Phases,” a hexagram from the Yijing, a constellation, days of the calendar, and a musical note.

c. Correlative Cosmology in the Tai xuan

In the Tai xuan, each tetragram is articulated though an evolving series of nine appraisals or judgments (whereas in the Yijing, each hexagram is articulated through a series of six line statements). These line appraisals unfold in a cyclical pattern corresponding to periods of time, the transformations of yin and yang, and a continuous cycle of commencement, maturity and decline. The appraisals can also be divided into those that address the commoner, the noble, and the Emperor.

Also, the often obscure correlative-poetic organization of the images and their associated line appraisals can be seen in the Tai xuan commentary “Numbers of the Dark Mystery,” an example of the Han genre of classificatory works known as leishu. For example, “Numbers of the Mystery” correlates the number five with the earth, the color yellow, fear, wind omens, tumuli, the naked animal (humankind), fur, bottles, weaving, sleeping mats, complying, verticality, glue, sacks, hubs, calves, coffins, bows and arrows, stupidity, and the center courtyard rain well. The basis of these associations is analogical; A is to B as C is to D. The organization scheme is fivefold. The five numerical categories (three and eight, four and nine, two and seven, one and six, and five) correspond to the five directions (east, west, south, north, center), the five phases (wood, metal, fire, water, earth), the seasons (spring, autumn, summer, winter, four seasons), the five colors (green, white, red, black, yellow), the five trades (carpentry, metal smithing, working with fire, waterworks, earth works), and the like.

4. Fa yan (Words to Live By)

a. Date and Significance

Unlike Yang Xiong’s other works, the dating of the Fa yan is fairly certain. In the final passage of the text, there is a reference to Wang Mang as the Duke of Han. The fact that Wang Mang held this title from 1-9 CE implies that the Fa yan could not have been submitted after 9 CE when he took the title of Emperor. In Fa yan 13:34 there is a reference to the Han dynasty as having ruled for 210 years. If the founding of the Han is taken to be 202 B.C.E., then the passage would have been written no earlier than 8 CE. Whatever the date of completion, there is little doubt that the Fa Yan was written during a period when Wang Mang held in his hands the reigns of power and the destiny of his sovereign. It remains his best-known work.

b. The Influence of the Lunyu

In his autobiography, Yang Xiong notes that, just as he modeled his Tai xuan on the greatest of the classics, the Yijing, so he modeled his Fa yan on the text he saw as the greatest of the commentaries - the Confucian Lunyu (Analects). Like the Lunyu, the Fa yan consists of a series of aphorisms and dialogues on a wide variety of historical and philosophical topics. Also like the Lunyu, the language of the Fa yan is archaic, its style terse, and its organization puzzling. While the form, language, and style of the Fa yan all seem to be derived from the Lunyu, the two works are most similar in their underlying concerns.

Both the Lunyu and the Fa Yan focus on the perennial Confucian theme of self-cultivation while emphasizing the importance of learning, friendship, role models, rites and music, and the human virtues. Both works look back to the ancient sage kings, the ways of the Zhou dynasty, and the teachings of the classics as models for their own troubled times. Each work has been read as a subtle attack on the predominant political powers. Finally, both the Lunyu and Fa yan can be characterized as works of frustration that lament the political instability of their respective times, the tendency of princes and officials to overstep their roles, and the failure of Confucius (Kongzi) and Yang Xiong to gain recognition or to exercise political influence.

c. Syncretism in the Fa yan

Among the disjointed sayings and dialogues of the Fa yan, one finds a wide variety of topics and themes. As noted, the most central of these are the perennial Confucian themes: self-cultivation, learning, the natural tendencies, the human virtues, the value of the classics, rites and music, the princely person, the sage, ruling, filial responsibility, and so forth. One also finds in the Fa yan discussions of concepts and themes usually associated with Daoism such as dao (way), de (potency), ziran (spontaneity), wuwei (non-coercive action), minimizing desire, and withdrawing from public life. These topics are often explicated through discussions of an unusually broad assortment of historical figures, including poets, philosophers, rhetoricians, rulers, officials, generals, merchants, rebels, assassins, jesters, recluses, and others. These topics are similarly interpreted through discussions of historical events, such as the collapse of the Zhou dynasty, the intrigues of the Warring States, the rise of the Qin dynasty and its rapid fall, the struggle between Xiang Ji (233-202 B.C.E.) and the Han dynastic founder Liu Bang (247-195 B.C.E.), and the founding of the Han dynasty.

Also included among the numerous topics discussed in the Fa yan are more immediate concerns of the late Former Han. These include the assimilation of heterodox teachings and popular superstitions into commentaries and interpretations of the classics, the decline of the ruling house of Han, the popularity of portents and the rise of Wang Mang, and government reforms in taxation, punishment, division of land, and relations with barbarian tribes. Finally, there are sayings and dialogues which address the concerns of scholar officials living not only in the troubled late Former Han, but throughout much of China’s long history - the practicality and viability of the Confucian way of life, the vanity of the desires for wealth, office and renown, and the challenges of surviving and maintaining one’s integrity in a time of disorder.

d. Old Text Themes in the Fa yan

Throughout the Fa yan, Yang Xiong sets the tone for subsequent representatives of the Old Text School by repeatedly poking fun at questions on magic, immortals, spirits, omens and portents, and esoteric interpretations of the classics. Instead he redirects attention toward concerns directly affecting the living: wealth and poverty, gain and loss, glory and disgrace, success and failure, friendship, joy, integrity, the dangers of public office, ruling the Empire, fate and circumstance, fleeing the world, and death. While the Tai xuan might be described as a synthesis of the various schools of early Chinese thought, the Fa yan elevates the Confucian school above all the others. In aphorism after aphorism, the Fa yan praises Confucius and the classics as the standards, stresses the importance of learning, rites and music, the five virtues, the five relations, and filial responsibility, while at the same time offering sardonic remarks on Daoist, Legalist, and yinyang and wuxing thinkers and their doctrines.

e. Political Philosophy in the Fa yan

On governing, the Fa yan can be seen as advancing a Reformist position. While the literary world of the late Former Han is often explicated in terms of the New and the Old Text schools, the political world of this period is similarly explicated in terms of two opposing camps: Modernists who, like earlier Legalists, advocated policies that sought to enrich the wealth and power of the state through conquering border tribes, opening trade routes, and establishing government monopolies, and Reformists who accused Modernists of ignoring the welfare of the people and advocated instead for a more frugal form of government that emphasized retrenchment in foreign policy, abolition of government monopolies, and land reform. In the Fa yan, Yang Xiong aligns himself with the Reformists by speaking out against government monopolies and expensive military campaigns and voices support for an easing of heavy burdens on the populace and the reinstitution of Zhou dynasty practices and policies.

The Reformist tone of the Fa yan gives credence to the association of Yang Xiong with “the Usurper,” Wang Mang, which has become standard throughout generations of Chinese scholarship. While Wang Mang’s rise to power met with opposition and spurred a number of insurrections, he seems to have found support in the ranks of court scholars for his display of Confucian virtue and his attempts to reorganize the social institutions of the Han along the lines of the Zhou dynasty - the system of rites and institutions highly prized by Confucian scholars since the Warring States period. Some have even seen Wang Mang as genuine in his espousal of Confucian ideals and as a sincere believer that reviving the institutions and rites of the Zhou dynasty would lead to a period of great peace and harmony. The more typical view, dating back to the account of Ban Gu (32-92 CE) in the Qian Han Shu (History of the Former Han), portrays Wang Mang as an ambitious, duplicitous, and murderous charlatan who rebelled against his sovereign and left the Empire in ruins.

Little is known of Yang Xiong’s actual political leanings in the face of Wang Mang’s rise to power. Those who portray Yang Xiong as a Wang Mang partisan point to the fact that, when Wang Mang declared himself Emperor, Yang Xiong did not commit suicide or leave court to become a recluse as did many other Han officials. His supporters, however, point out that, in his earlier poetic works and in the Fa yan, Yang Xiong has a great deal to say - most of it critical - about men who, in the name of principle, committed suicide or fled to the mountains. As noted above, it appears that Yang Xiong preferred instead to follow his teacher Zhuang Zun - though not as a recluse among men, but as a recluse at court. Although the Fa yan was written during Wang Mang’s rise in power and apparently finished shortly before his usurpation, he is mentioned only once in it. Nonetheless, some read the text as an apology for Wang Mang’s usurpation and the Confucian reforms he attempted to institute. Others read the Fa yan as consisting of a number of cleverly veiled attacks on Wang Mang’s penchant for superstition, his insatiable ambition, and his pretense to being a humble Confucian.

Some passages of the Fa yan have been read as offering neither flattery nor ridicule but bold admonitions, counseling Wang Mang to remember his filial duties and to return the reigns of power to the rightful ruler. For example, in Fa yan 8:21, there is a terse passage that reads, “The Red and Black Bows and Arrows do not amount to having it.” Centuries earlier the Imperial house of the Zhou dynasty awarded princes a set of bows and arrows as symbol of investiture to punish all within their jurisdiction. In an attempt to follow this ancient tradition, a set of red and black bows and arrows was awarded to Wang Mang in 5 CE as part of the “Conferment of the Nine Distinctions” bestowed on him by ministers, officials, and scholars of the Han court. While commentators uniformly read the phrase “red and black bows and arrows” in Fa yan 8:21 as a reference to this award, they are divided over its meaning. While some see 8:21 as flattering praise, others see it as reminding Wang Mang that having been bestowed the honor of the “Red and Black Bows and Arrows” does not amount to the possession of the mandate.

The passage most frequently cited as evidence of Yang Xiong’s political leanings is found in Fa yan 13:34, where Wang Mang is compared to two of the greatest ministers in Chinese history: Zhou Gong (the Duke of Zhou, c. 12th century B.C.E.) and Yi Yin (c. 18th century B.C.E.). Given the location of this passage at the very end of the text, some have considered it to be a forgery. Others have seen it as a flattering endorsement of Wang Mang. The great Neo-Confucian philosopher Zhu Xi (1130-1200 CE), for example, reads this passage as lavish praise of Wang Mang’s achievements and, on the basis of it, dismisses Yang Xiong as “Wang Mang’s Grandee.” Still others have seen it as admonishing Wang Mang to be like Yi Yin and Zhou Gong before him and to return the reigns of power to his rightful sovereign. It is important to point out that, like Wang Mang, both Yi Yin and Zhou Gong served as Imperial Regents. Like Yi Yin, Wang Mang stood in the wings through a series of short-lived reigns. As in the case of Yi Yin, it fell on Wang Mang to name a successor to the throne. Both Yi Yin and Wang Mang served as regents while their hand-picked successors lacked maturity. But while Yi Yin and Zhou Gong are remembered for handing back the reigns of power, Wang Mang is popularly remembered in the chengyu (proverb) as one who “usurped the Han and named himself Emperor.”

f. View of Human Nature

As Wing-tsit Chan and others have pointed out, the view for which Yang Xiong has become most famous – that human nature is a mixture of good and evil – is articulated only in a single passage of the Fa yan (3:2) and is not elaborated any further:

Human nature is a muddle [hun] of good and evil tendencies. Cultivating the good tendencies makes a person good. Cultivating the evil ones makes a person depraved. This force [qi] - is it not like a horse that drives one towards good or evil?

This hardly amounts to the kind of sustained development of a view of human nature found, for example, in the work of Mencius or Xunzi, who represent opposite poles on the continuum of ancient Chinese views of human nature. Nonetheless, Yang Xiong’s view here, although undefended in philosophical terms, contradicts Mencius’ view that human nature originally is good and can only be warped (but never entirely destroyed) through neglect or negative influences. After Mencius’ view became the orthodox one among Confucians, especially during the Neo-Confucian movement of medieval and early modern China, Yang Xiong’s work came in for a great deal of criticism from Confucians. Thus, rather like Xunzi, Yang Xiong may be seen as something of a black sheep among early Confucians because of his deviation from what became Confucian orthodoxy in a later age.

5. Poetical Works

Before being summoned to court, Yang Xiong wrote a number of poetic pieces of which only one - Fan sao (Refuting Sorrow) - survives. As Yang Xiong explains in his autobiography, Fan Sao was written in response to Li sao (Encountering Sorrow), a poem by the legendary Warring States poet Qu Yuan (340-278 B.C.E.). According to the Shiji (Historical Records) account, Qu Yuan served as a trusted official to King Huai of Chu, but, after he was slandered by a jealous minister, he fell from favor and was exiled. Qu Yuan desperately wished to return to the service of King Huai, but in the end he gave up hope and after composing Li sao, he drowned himself.

While Yang Xiong’s Fan sao is similar in style to Qu Yuan’s Li sao, its outlook is very different. Qu Yuan saw suicide as the only option left to persons of character living in a corrupt age. Yang Xiong, on the other hand, compares Qu Yuan’s response to failure in the political sphere with the response of Confucius. Unlike Qu Yuan, Confucius’s disappointments in searching for rulers who would employ him in “making good government” did not stop him from living a full life of travel, teaching, and writing. Here and in his later philosophical works, we find Yang Xiong maintaining that success and failure do not come down to individual effort but have much to do with the times and circumstances in which one lives. If one does not meet one’s proper time for acting, then one should retire or withdraw and like a snake or dragon lie submerged or like a phoenix remain concealed and wait for more advantageous times.

While at court, Yang Xiong composed a number of primarily autobiographical poetic pieces where he reflects on his poverty, lowly position, lack of recognition, and the ridicule and difficulties these frustrations have engendered. In Jie chao (Dissolving Ridicule), for example, Yang Xiong portrays himself as ridiculed for his low position and his failure to influence the court. In responding, Yang Xiong reiterates a familiar theme in his writings, arguing that in an age beset with chaos, it is better to remain silent and unknown since, as David R. Knechtges translates it, “those who grab for power die, and those who remain silent survive; those who reach the highest positions endanger their family, while those who maintain themselves intact survive.” In Zhu bin (Expelling Poverty), Yang Xiong expels an unwelcome guest named “Poverty” whose lingering presence in the poet’s life has labored his body and afflicted his health, cut him off from friends, and slowed his promotion in office. After listening to Yang Xiong vent, Poverty humbly agrees to leave, but first reminds Yang Xiong of the virtue of the impoverished sage Shun, warns him of the greed of the tyrants Jie and Zhi, and offers the consolation that it is only because of his privation that the poet is able to bear heat and cold, and to live freely with equanimity. Enlightened, Yang Xiong apologizes to Poverty and welcomes him as an honored guest.

Yang Xiong wrote several pieces in a genre known as fu, a term translated by Knechtges as “rhapsody.” Marked by its florid imagery and ecstatic tone, this genre was commonly employed by Han court officials as a means of offering indirect criticism and admonition to the Emperor. As Knechtges points out, most of the well known early writers of rhapsodies, such as Lu Jia (228-140 B.C.E.) and Jia Yi (200-168 B.C.E.), were not only poets but also scholar-officials who saw it as their duty to offer advice and remonstrance (jian) to rulers and did so through their poetic works. In the rhapsodies of later Former Han writers like Sima Xiangru, however, verbal decoration and entertainment took precedence over instruction and admonition.

In his early years at the court of Emperor Cheng, Yang Xiong submitted a number of rhapsodies. At first glance, these works appear to be little more than ornate, fanciful, and flattering descriptions of Imperial spectacles. In Fa yan (Words to Live By) and in the autobiographical section of his biography, however, Yang Xiong stresses that, like earlier poets, he envisioned the primary purpose of these works to be remonstrance - a dangerous political task widely recognized as one of the most central duties of the Confucian scholar. While, on the surface, Yang Xiong’s rhapsodies heap lavish praise on the Emperor, they also contain stern reprimands and warning. For example, within the fanciful descriptions of Imperial grandeur found in the Ganquan fu (Sweet Springs Rhapsody), Yang Xiong indirectly admonishes Emperor Cheng to be more solemn in conducting affairs, suggesting through allusion that, like the lascivious tyrant kings Jie and Xia, Emperor Cheng’s wanton conduct would lead to his downfall. In the Jiaolie fu (Barricade Hunt Rhapsody) and the Changyang fu (Changyang Palace Rhapsody), both of which commemorate imperial hunts, Yang Xiong indirectly criticizes the hunts as lavish, wasteful spectacles that burden the peasants and destroy their farms and farmlands. In his later writings, Yang Xiong claims that he eventually came to see the ornate style of rhapsody as excessive, and realizing that the moral admonitions he tried to provide had gone unheeded (if not unnoticed), he renounced it. He never gave up writing poetry altogether, however.

6. References and Further Reading

There are very few published studies of Yang Xiong in English. Of these, Nylan’s pioneering translation and commentary of the Tai Xuan (1993) is the most complete account of Yang Xiong’s philosophy, while Knechtges’s studies of Yang Xiong’s fu poetry (1976, 1977) and his Qian Han Shu biography (1982) offer superb translations and interpretations of Yang Xiong’s life and literary works. Colvin (2001) provides a translation of the Fa yan and an examination of the seemingly haphazard organization of its aphorisms and dialogues. For a fuller understanding of Yang Xiong’s thought, readers are encouraged to explore the more general accounts of the literary, intellectual, and political contexts of the Former Han dynasty in Bielenstein (1984), Feng (1953), Loewe (1974, 1986), Thomsen (1988), Xiao (1979), and Yu (1967).

  • Bielenstein, Hans. “Han Portents and Prognostications.” Museum of Far Eastern Antiquities 56 (1984): 97-112.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit. “Taoistic Confucianism: Yang Hsiung.” In A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy, ed. Wing-tsit Chan (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963), 289-291.
  • Colvin, Andrew. Patterns of Coherence in Yang Xiong’s Fa Yan. Ph.D. dissertation, University of Hawaii at Manoa, 2001.
  • Doeringer, Franklin M. Yang Xiong and his Formulation of a Classicism. Ph.D. dissertation, Columbia University, 1971.
  • Feng, Yulan. A History of Chinese Philosophy, Vol. 2: The Period of Classical Learning. Trans. Derke Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
  • Knechtges, David R. The Han Rhapsody: A Study of the Fu of Yang Xiong (53 B.C.- A.D.18). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1976.
  • Knechtges, David R. “Uncovering the Sauce Jar: A Literary Interpretation of Yang Hsiung’s Chu ch’in mei Hsin.” In Ancient China: Studies in Early Civilization, eds. David T. Roy et al (Hong Kong: Chinese University Press, 1977), 229-252.
  • Knechtges, David R. “The Liu Hsin /Yang Hsiung Correspondence on the Fang Yen.” Monumenta Serica 33 (1977): 309-325.
  • Knechtges, David R. The Han Shu Biography of Yang Xiong (53 B.C. to A.D. 18). Tempe: Arizona State University Press, 1982.
  • Loewe, Michael. Crisis and Conflict in Han China 104 B.C. to A.D. 9. London: George Allen and Unwin, 1974.
  • Nylan, Michael. The Canon of Supreme Mystery by Yang Xiong: A Translation with Commentary of the T’ai Hsüan Ching. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1993.
  • Nylan, Michael. “Han Classicists Writing in Dialogue about their Own Tradition.” Philosophy East & West 47/2 (1996): 133-188.
  • Thomsen, Rudi. Ambition and Confucianism: A Biography of Wang Mang. Aarhus: Aarhus University Press, 1988.
  • Twichett, Denis, and Michael Loewe, eds. The Cambridge History of China, Vol. 1: The Ch’in and Han Empires, 221 B.C. - A.D. 220. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • Xiao, Gongjun. A History of Chinese Political Thought, Vol. 1: From the Beginnings to the Sixth Century A.D. Trans. F.W. Mote. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979.
  • Yu, Yingshi. Trade and Expansion in Han China. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1967.

Author Information

Andrew Colvin
Slippery Rock University
U. S. A.

Wang Yangming (1472—1529)

wangyangmingWang Yangming, also known as Wang Shouren (Wang Shou-jen), is one of the most influential philosophers in the Confucian tradition. He is best known for his theory of the unity of knowledge and action. A capable and principled administrator and military official, he was exiled from 1507 to 1510 for his protest against political corruption. Although he studied the thought of Zhu Xi [Chu His] (1130-1200 CE) seriously in his teenage years, it was during this period of exile that he developed his contribution to what has become known as Neo-Confucianism (Daoxue, [Tao-hsueh or “Learning of the Way”). With Neo-Confucianism in general, Wang Yangming’s thought can be best understood as an attempt to propose personal morality as the main way to social well-being. Wang’s legacy in Neo-Confucian tradition and Confucian philosophy as a whole is his claim that the fundamental root of social problems lies in the fact that one fails to gain a genuine understanding of one’s self and its relation to the world, and thus fails to live up to what one could be.

Table of Contents

  1. Intellectual Context
  2. Philosophical Anthropology
  3. Redefinition of the World
  4. The Unity of Knowledge and Action
  5. Recent Scholarship on Wang Yangming
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Intellectual Context

Neo-Confucians, above all, urged people to engage in what they thought was “true learning,” which led to the genuine realization of the self. However, the cultural landscape of early and mid-Ming dynasty China (1368-1644 CE) did not unfold as Neo-Confucians wished. To understand the shared theoretical challenge that Wang Yangming confronted, one should first note that quite a number of Neo-Confucians at that time had contempt for what they thought was a certain vulgarized form of Confucian learning. This “vulgar learning” (suxue) included such activities as memorization and recitation (jisong), literary composition (cizhang), textual studies (xungu), and broad learning (boxue). To the eyes of Neo-Confucians, all these forms of learning represent learning that is aimed at accumulating external knowledge for its own sake. As a consequence, these forms of learning disregarded what Neo-Confucians considered to be the true purpose of the learning: construction of the moral self.

Ironically, the rampant increase in charges that certain work is “vulgar” was linked to the very triumph of Neo-Confucianism in general, and to Zhu Xi’s learning in particular, through its official recognition by the Ming state. While is true that, by the early Ming, “Cheng-Zhu” learning (named after the brothers Cheng Yi [Ch’eng I] and Cheng Hao [Ch’eng Hao] as well as the aforementioned Zhu Xi) had already enjoyed official recognition for over one hundred years, it was at this time that the institutionalization of the Cheng-Zhu teaching in early Ming was relatively complete. As is well known, by the time of the Yongle reign (1403-24), Cheng-Zhu learning had become fully established as the basis for the civil service examination that was the exclusive pathway to government service in imperial China. The Emperor Cheng Zu embraced Cheng-Zhu Neo-Confucianism and ordered Hu Kuang (1370-1418) and others to compile an official version of Zhu Xi’s commentaries on the Four Books (the Confucian Lunyu or Analects, the Mengzi or Mencius, the Daxue or Great Learning, and the Zhongyong or Doctrine of the Mean) and Five Classics (the Shujing or Classic of History, the Shijing or Classic of Poetry, the Yijing or Classic of Changes, Liji or Record of Rituals, and the Xiaojing or Classic of Filial Piety). Their effort resulted in the comprehensive anthology of the Great Compendia on the Five Classics and the Four Books.

The establishment of Neo-Confucianism as the examination curriculum contributed to what some thinkers considered to be the “vulgarization” of Neo-Confucian moral teaching. As Cheng-Zhu learning served as the basis of the civil examinations, those who wanted to get involved in the political arena had to master it regardless of whether or not they agreed with the essence of its teaching. In other words, they studied it for the sake of their worldly interests rather than out of concern for moral self-fulfillment. Wang Yangming was one of the most prominent among those thinkers who found it difficult to accept both “vulgar learning” and the form of Neo-Confucian learning that was vulnerable to degeneration into “vulgar learning.” One can find Wang’s lengthy critique of “vulgar learning” in the section of “Pulling up the root and stopping up the source” in Chuan xi lu (“Instructions for Practical Living” in Wing-tsit Chan’s translation).

While Cheng-Zhu learning was different from “vulgar learning” in its fundamental orientation, Wang Yangming thought that Cheng-Zhu style of “investigation of things” (gewu) was particularly susceptible to degeneration into “vulgar learning. So, what was at stake in Wang Yangming’s reformulation of Neo-Confucianism was the issue of how to reinvent Confucian learning in a way different from the way of Cheng-Zhu Neo-Confucianism, which turned out to be susceptible to “vulgarization.”

2. Philosophical Anthropology

In Wang’s mind, given the fact that the practitioners of “vulgar learning” devote their attention only to the accumulation of external knowledge, what is potentially problematic in Cheng-Zhu style of “investigation of things” is its search for moral principle (li) in the external world (as well as in the mind, xin [hsin]). Wang believed that the internalization of li resolved many problems that “vulgar learning” created. Wang’s idea that “the mind is principle” (xin ji li) expresses his belief succinctly. The most apparent and significant implication of xin ji li is the change of the locus of li from the external world (and the mind) to solely the mind. However, the proposition of xin ji li indicates more than the locus of li.

First, li does not simply reside in the mind but is coextensive with the mind. Accordingly, li does not exist as a distinguishable, searchable entity in the mind. Rather we call li the state in which the mind is so well preserved that it responds to the situation properly. In this sense, xin ji li meant a kind of evaluation that the mind could embody, a desirable quality represented by the concept of li, rather than a formula expressing the relationship between two distinct entities. Since li was not conceived as a static principle that one could discern and hold fast to, being attuned to li involved nothing other than having no selfish desires. In other words, we should not “seek the Principle of Nature” because principle is not something we can “seek.”

Second, the identification of xin and li brought about significant changes in the understanding of the mind as well. These changes in the understanding of the mind entailed a new philosophical anthropology. The mind -- the unstable entity that was formerly understood in terms of qi (ch’i, vital force) and believed to be vulnerable to evil -- is now conceived as li, the perfect moral entity.

Many of Wang’s statements, such as “The nature of all humans is good” and “[T]he original substance of the mind is characterized by the highest good; is there anything in the original substance of the mind that is not good?” show that he upheld the typical Neo-Confucian premise of the goodness of human nature. However, Wang’s philosophical anthropology was different from that of Cheng-Zhu Neo-Confucianism in that it pushed the premise of the goodness of human nature to its extreme.

In Cheng-Zhu Neo-Confucianism, xin means the operation of the subjective consciousness, or the location where the operation of the subjective consciousness takes place. If xin represents the immediate self as a current flow of consciousness while li is a normative state that should be embodied, xin ji li means, above all, that the mind ceases to be one of the loci where the moral principle resides; it achieves the very status of moral principle itself. This identification of xin and xing (hsing, nature) means creating a notion of the self-sufficient moral agent by negating the distinction between the potential goodness of the self and the actual state of the self.

While this notion of a self-sufficient moral agent is encouraging, it was not without problems for a group of intellectuals. For example, Luo Qinshun thought that the identification of the subjective function of the mind with the objective reality of principle constituted “a case of an infinitesimal mistake in the beginning leading to an infinite error at the end.” How so?

In the view of people like Luo, the notion of a self-sufficient moral agent contained in the formula of xin ji li appears virtually bereft of any viable tension between the ideal and the actual: the immediate, actual self is the ideal. This absence of a normative tension poses a certain threat to the rigor of morality. This is why they criticized the notion of a self-sufficient moral agent as being a source of arbitrariness and subjectivism in moral behavior. However, normative tension is not completely out of sight for those who advocate the formula of xin ji li. For one thing, Wang’s distinction between the mind in itself (xin zhi benti) and the so-called human mind (renxin) provides one with a standard with which to distinguish between the normative state and the actual state of the self. For Wang, the “mind in itself” represents the original state of the mind, which possesses the perfect faculty of moral judgment. The “human mind” represents the state of the mind that is “obscured” by selfish human desires, and thus does not realize the perfect faculty of moral judgment. Since the immediate state of the mind often remains at the level of the human mind, one is expected to endeavor to recover the mind in itself.

As long as Wang maintains a distinction between the mind in itself and the human mind, what is really at issue is not whether to posit a normative ideal, but how to conceptualize a normative ideal. Most important to his conceptualization, Wang does not conceive the normative ideal independently of the functioning of the mind. That is, there is no ontological difference between the normative ideal and the actual, for both the mind in itself and the human mind represent certain states of our consciousness. The only difference between the mind in itself and the human mind is whether or not the mind is clouded by selfish desire.

Thus, the main consequence of this way of conceiving a normative ideal is that our current state of mind is able to return to its original state simply by getting rid of selfish desires, without a separate effort to apprehend normative principle.

Distinguishing the goodness that reflects the original state of the mind from the badness that stems from selfish desires is absolutely critical in the process of returning to the original state of the mind. Such knowledge is just another aspect of the self-sufficient nature of the self. Following the Mencian tradition, Wang called this knowledge liangzhi (innate knowing). According to Wang, liangzhi possesses several intriguing features:

  1. Everyone without exception possesses liangzhi.
  2. Liangzhi is innate, not something acquired by learning. Thus, effort is necessary not for forming liangzhi but for setting it in motion.
  3. Liangzhi is not subject to variation or change due to time and place. One’s inner source of moral guidance can be simply applied to human conduct or society irrespective of the circumstances. Also, one can understand and make perfect judgments about things without much information.
  4. We can never lose liangzhi. At worst, we simply lose sight of it. Since liangzhi is always present in the mind, one can always activate it anytime if one desires it. “Once determined to reform, he recovers at once his own mind.”
  5. The character of liangzhi is intuitive. For Wang, the power of liangzhi lies in its ability properly to respond to any situation, rather than in factual knowledge that involves concrete information. In this way, Wang emphasized the intuitive power of the mind. Wang’s invoking of the image of the mirror and balance well expresses his emphasis on the intuitive moral sensitivity that liangzhi possesses. Both the mirror and balance give us knowledge of a given object by making it possible to reflect and weigh it without previous understanding. This aspect of Wang’s learning can be characterized as anti-“over-intellectualizing.”
  6. Despite its intuitional character, liangzhi is perfect. People often tend to lose sight of liangzhi because of selfish human desire. But once one gets rid of selfish human desire, the perfect power of liangzhi is completely restored. Simply put, “it [innate knowledge] knows everything” In short, when liangzhi is rendered as innate knowledge, knowledge means the capacity for moral judgment rather than factual knowledge. Thus, if we were but in full contact with liangzhi, liangzhi would make people perfectly moral rather than erudite. For Wang, however, such moral judgment presupposes a total understanding of a given situation.
  7. For Wang, who believed in the perfect, intuitive power of liangzhi, resolution based on confidence was important: “There is the sage in everyone. Only one who has not enough self-confidence buries his own chance.”
  8. Trusting in innate moral knowing, Wang seemed to simplify the cumbersome process of learning, considering it to be a matter of eliminating selfish desires: “In learning to become a sage, the student needs only to get rid of selfish human desires and preserve the Principle of Nature, which is like refining gold and achieving perfection in quality.” People are no longer under the burden of any other business except for getting rid of selfish desire.

All of the above points together explain the populist ethos in Wang’s learning, as we see in Wang’s famous statement: “All the people filling the street are sages.” For Wang, becoming a fully moral agent is simple and easy. “Just don’t try to deceive it [liangzhi] but sincerely and truly follow in whatever you do. Then the good will be perceived and evil will be removed. What security and joy there is in this!” It cannot but be easy because we are already fully moral agents. As self-sufficient moral subjects we do not need to engage in the exploration of the external world.

3. Redefinition of the World

Wang wanted to show that moral awareness depended on the self. While the importance of the moral agent is quite understandable in the moral sphere, it begs the question of what kind of relation moral principle has to the world out there if the ontological status of moral principle hinges solely on the moral agent. In other words, how could it be that one’s moral principle is completely in the mind and, at the same time, vitally connected to the world out there? Answering this question is absolutely critical if Wang’s reassertion of personal morality is to be socially responsible. Wang’s sense of social responsibility is clear when he wants to distinguish his own convictions from those of Buddhists, whom Confucians have regarded as forsaking the external world. “In nourishing the mind, we Confucians have never departed from things and events.”

On what ground, then, could Wang maintain that his learning was focused on the mind and, at the same time, did not depart from the external world? How did Wang resolve this contradiction? As is expected in his rhetorical question, “Is there any affair in the world outside of the mind?” the answer lay in his redefinition of the world in such a way that there was no affair outside of the mind.

According to Wang, the external world is not something out there, as distinct from the mind, but “that to which the operation of the mind is directed.” This redefinition of the external world is based on the insight that everything we can know about the world is mediated by experience. This experience is made possible by our sense organs. The activity of these sense organs is associated with the mind. Thus, all things that we encounter in our lives are necessarily associated with the mind. The world so conceived is no longer an independent entity external to the mind, but an inseparable part of the mind. According to this picture, the external world exists always in reference to the self.

This position makes one wonder if the external world does not exist without the operation of one’s mind. However, what Wang Yangming cares about is not (scientific) investigation of the existence of the world itself -- which is a question of modern epistemology -- but the perspective from which we can properly understand our relationship to the world. When Wang asks rhetorically, “Is there any affair in the world outside of the mind?” the message he is trying to convey is that all the things and affairs in our lives exist in an activated state, so that is what we should have in mind when we think about the world.

How, then, is the world in an activated state? The practitioners of “vulgar learning” often take the world as something statically “out there.” When they produce factual knowledge, they assume a static world-picture to the extent that they can produce fixed knowledge. However, if we accept Wang’s definition of things as “that to which the operation of the mind is directed,” the real world in our lives turns out to be the experienced world. In other words, the world is not silent, inert, and vacant, but activated and awakened. Indeed, life manifests itself in movements like eating, going to bed, and speaking rather than seeing while stationary. To be exact, we are, in a sense, moving when we are stationary, for we are experiencing something incessantly. Common metaphors of life -- such as passage, travel, voyage, and journey -- are related to this kind of mobility in our life-experience. What are the implications of Wang’s redefinition of the external world?

First, the most significant implication of this change in the meaning of the external world is that Wang has in principle dismissed the necessity of exploring the external world independent of the self. Under this framework, to take the mind seriously is none other than to do justice to the external world. Thus, Wang said, “The mind is the master of Heaven-and-Earth and myriad things. The mind is none other than Heaven. If we mention the mind, Heaven-and-Earth and the myriad things all are also mentioned automatically.”

Second, what we notice in Wang’s redefinition of the world is a reformulation of the relation between the mind as subject and the world as object. Wang suspected that the distinction between the mind as perceiving subject and the world as perceived object could, by creating a gap between self and world, make genuine Confucian learning liable to degenerate into “vulgar learning,” which justified the pursuit of external knowledge that was irrelevant to the self. Thus, Wang saw our experienced and lived reality as constituted in and through an inseparable relation between the mind and the world. In his reconceptualization of this relationship, inner and outer were unified because the mind was the world. This seamless conception of the mind and the world overcame the gulf between the subject and the object that “vulgar learning” engenderd.

Third, this rearrangement of the mind’s relation to the world makes the mind and the world coextensive. For Wang, the mind and the external world are not fully distinguishable, for the world is no more than that to which the operation of the mind is directed. This new arrangement of the mind’s relation to the world gives us total contact with both the self and the larger world from the beginning. We can say that the distance between the world and us is shortened in the sense that our access to the world is unmediated, and there is no world that exists beyond the scope of the self.

4. The Unity of Knowledge and Action

Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action (zhixing heyi) is probably the most well-known aspect of Wang’s philosophy. Some of the most puzzling aspects of Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action can be best understood by way of Wang’s conception of self and world.

The issue of the relationship between knowledge and action concerns the relationship between knowledge about (moral) matters and doing what the knowledge calls for. Traditionally, Chinese thought in general, and Zhu Xi in particular, maintained that once one acquired knowledge, one should do one’s best to put such knowledge into practice. In discussing Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action, however, we first need to make clear that by his theory of the unity of knowledge and action, Wang was not asserting a traditional idea. Indeed, this was precisely the position that Wang wished to repudiate.

Despite the emphasis on the need for knowledge to be put into practice, the traditional position presupposed two possibilities: first, that one can have knowledge without/prior to corresponding action; and second, that one can know what is the proper action, but still fail to act. Because of these two possibilities, the traditional position left open the possibility of separating knowledge and action, but called for the overcoming of this separation.

However, Wang denied both possibilities. These two denials constitute the essence of Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action. First, according to Wang, it is only through simultaneous action that one can obtain knowledge: “If you want to know bitterness, you have to eat a bitter melon yourself.” Wang denied any other possible routes to obtain knowledge.

According to Wang, it is not possible for one to put something into practice after acquiring knowledge. This is because knowledge and action are unified already, from beginning to end. We cannot unify knowledge and action because they are already unified. Of course, Wang was aware of the claims that “there are people who know that parents should be served with filial piety and elder brothers with respect but cannot put these things into practice. This shows that knowledge and action are clearly two different things.” Wang’s answer was: “The knowledge and action you refer to are already separated by selfish desires and are no longer knowledge and action in their original state.” In other words, knowledge necessarily/automatically leads to action in its original state. We cannot have knowledge while preventing it from leading to action.

Understanding these two apparently non-commonsensical ideas is crucial for understanding of Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action, for they are the points that differentiated Wang’s position from preceding positions. In order to understand them, we need to examine what Wang meant by “knowledge” and “action.” Furthermore, considering Wang’s view of self and world is indispensable to any examination of Wang’s notions of “knowledge” and “action.”

First, knowledge in Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action may not necessarily be the knowledge we conventionally imagine. What Wang meant by knowledge in his discussion of knowledge and action is not grasping information that was “out there” -- which is prevalent in what Wang characterized as “vulgar learning.” What Wang meant was knowledge of how to act in a given situation, as we will confirm in Wang’s statements concerning the unity of knowledge and action. Where, then, does knowledge of how to act come from? This question brings us to Wang’s theory of philosophical anthropology and his notion of liangzhi. Liangzhi is supposed to provide that kind of certainty for action. The English translation of liangzhi is innate knowledge or innate knowing, which suggests that we already possess all the knowledge we need to have. We do not have to spend any time to acquire knowledge. Precisely speaking, we cannot acquire knowledge, for we, as self-sufficient moral agents, already possess it from the very beginning. Thus, it would be nonsense to say that we need to know before in order to act. In this sense, what we mean by “knowing” is not to attain from outside what is previously absent but to experience the operation of our innate knowledge/knowing in the concrete situations of our own lives. “To ‘obtain’ means to get in the mind; it is not infused from without.” From this we can understand Wang’s strange idea that it is only through simultaneous action that one can obtain knowledge. For action is the process of activating our innate knowledge. Thus, Wang said, “Can anyone learn without action?” What we conventionally think of as attaining knowledge is nothing other than experiencing knowledge that we already have.

But what, precisely, is action? Wang did not think of moral action in terms of willing and then performing an action. For him, the true perception of a situation automatically and immediately sets action into motion. In emphasizing the setting-in-motion of action followed by the perception of a situation, the action in Wang’s theory does not exactly correspond to the kinds of acts we have conventionally in mind. For Wang, action means all responses to a given situation. This includes studying, which was not conventionally regarded as belonging to the realm of action.

At the same time, Wang tended to consider action as responses to given situations rather than action in a vacuum. This point is evident in his examples of responses to such things as color, smell, and taste. When action is conceived largely as a response to a given situation, we cannot avoid acting. We never depart from the “situation” in which we find ourselves.

To understand further why Wang conceived of action as a response to a given situation, we need to remember his redefinition of the world. To describe the actual fabric of life that Wang had in mind, we have invoked the sense of movement, which posited an alternative to the more static conception of experience -- one that deceived one into thinking that one stood outside the actual world. For Wang, our lives consist of living in the moment.

With this understanding of Wang’s notion of knowledge and action in mind, let us imagine the situation in which one acts with one’s knowledge. First of all, one does not spend any time to attain knowledge. All one needs is to respond to a given situation. Knowledge is not fixed knowledge, but consists of ever-changing responses to shifting situations: “Innate knowledge is to minute details and varying circumstances as compasses and measures are to areas and lengths. Details and circumstances cannot be predetermined, just as areas and lengths are infinite in number and cannot be entirely covered.” Wang is invoking “the radically context sensitive and particularist nature of moral judgement.” Accordingly, the knowledge is intuitive. As action is the natural inner workings of liangzhi in the form of reaction, there is no gap between knowledge and action.

Keeping the above understanding of knowledge and action in mind, we can understand the aforementioned two idiosyncratic points in Wang’s theory of the unity of knowledge and action. First, it is only through simultaneous action that one can obtain knowledge. This is because one already possesses knowledge. What seems to be a process of obtaining knowledge is in reality the process of activating innate knowledge. Knowledge is activated through the contact with the situation, and this is called “action.” Second, knowledge necessarily/automatically leads to action. For Wang, knowledge means knowing how to respond to a given situation and action is responding to a given situation. Furthermore, one cannot help responding to the world because one is “moving” in every moment. Action is no longer an operation subsequent to the formulation of knowledge of the world, but a fundamental mode of human life. Given that one innately has knowledge of how to act in all situations, and that one cannot help acting, knowledge necessarily leads to action. When knowledge and action appear to be separate, it is because one has not activated one’s true knowledge -- a result of delusion due to selfish desire or false learning: “There have never been people who know but do not act. Those who are supposed to know but do not act simply do not yet know.”

According to Wang, the normative picture of the universe is that moral agents are living their lives actualizing their liangzhi in the form of the unity of knowledge and action. In this picture, the betterment of society depends on the expansion of the self’s ability to respond morally to the world. Thus, Wang repeatedly reasserts the validity of the Neo-Confucian promise -- the salvation of the world through personal morality -- which is based on the assumption that “Governance depends on human beings (wei zheng zai ren).”

In his own time, Wang’s teaching was enthusiastically received. Although Wang’s new mode of thinking was rapidly gaining currency among intellectuals, for those who did not subscribe to his ideas Wang’s formulation was nothing more than a mistaken answer to the problem. Thus, Wang came to serve as a catalyst for complex and wide-ranging debates and controversies. No matter how later generation of thinkers would evaluate the legacy of Wang’s learning, it could hardly be denied that with Wang Yangming the tradition of Chinese philosophy became richer and more complex.

5. Recent Scholarship on Wang Yangming

Leaving aside Wang Yangming's importance in his own time, he deserves attention because of his tremendous, long-lived influence on Chinese intellectual history. Not surprisingly, therefore, important studies of Wang Yangming have been produced all the way up to the present.

In Anglophone scholarship, the work of Frederick Goodrich Henke (1916) and Wing-tsit Chan (1963) has made available translations of Wang’s major works. Wing-tsit Chan (1970) provides a bird’s-eye view on the flow of thought from the early Ming through Wang’s era by scrutinizing the evolution of “the learning of mind” in early Ming thinkers. Wang’s thought also has been explored by Tu Weiming (1976) in terms of the interaction between his life history and the formation of his major doctrines. Wm. Theodore de Bary (1970) has discussed the progression of thought in the late Ming in terms of the unfolding of “Wang Learning.” The work of Julia Ching (1976) also merits consideration. More recently, P. J. Ivanhoe (2002) has discussed Mencius’ and Wang’s philosophies from a comparative perspective.

In Japanese scholarship, the compilation of Yōmeigaku Taikei (Compendium of Yangming Learning) is most prominent among many works. In his classic study, Shushigaku to Yōmeigaku (Zhu Xi Learning and Yangming Learning) (1967), Shimada Kenzi attempts to compare the thought of Wang with that of Zhu Xi. However, his analysis does not pay attention to the specific historical contents of their philosophical movements, while Togawa Yoshio’s Jukyōshi (A History of Confucianism) (1987) pays relatively more attention to this issue.

In mainland China, Wang’s thought has been interpreted as subjective idealism and criticized by Marxist scholars despite the fact that the influence of Marxist ideology has become relatively weak since the end of Cultural Revolution (c. 1966-1976). Yang Guorong (1990) diachronically narrates the development of the structure of Wang’s philosophy. The work of Chen Lai (1991) also is worthy of attention.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Araki Kengo, et al, comp. Yōmeigaku Taikei. 12 vols. Tokyo: Meitoku shuppansha, 1971-73.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, trans. Instructions for Practical Living and Other Neo-Confucian Writings by Wang Yang-ming. New York: Columbia University Press, 1963.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit. “The Ch’eng-Chu School of Early Ming.” In Self and Society in Ming Thought, ed. W. T. de Bary (New York: Columbia University Press, 1970): 29-51.
  • Chen Lai. Youwuzhijing: Wang Yangming zhuxue de jingshen (The Realm of Being and Non-being: The Spirit of Wang Yangming’s Philosophy). Beijing: Renmin Chubanshe, 1991.
  • Ching, Julia, ed. To Acquire Wisdom: The Way of Wang Yang-ming. New York: Columbia University Press, 1976.
  • de Bary, W. T. “Individualism and Humanitarianism in Late Ming Thought.” In Self and Society in Ming Thought, ed. W. T. de Bary (New York: Columbia University Press, 1970): 145-247.
  • Henke, Frederick Goodrich. The Philosophy of Wang Yang-Ming. Chicago: Open Court, 1916.
  • Ivanhoe, P.J. Ethics in the Confucian Tradition. 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2002.
  • Shimada Kenji. Shushigaku to Yōmeigaku (Zhu Xi Learning and Yangming Learning). Tokyo: Iwanami shoten, 1967.
  • Togawa Yoshio, et al. Jukyōshi (A History of Confucianism). Tokyo: Yamakawa Shuppansha, 1987.
  • Tu Weiming. Neo-Confucian Thought in Action: Wang Yang-ming’s Youth (1472-1509). Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1976.
  • Yang Guorong. Wangxue tonglun (A Comprehensive Study of Wang Learning). Shanghai: Shanghai sanlianshudian, 1990.

Author Information

Youngmin Kim
Seoul National University
South Korea

Neo-Confucian Philosophy

confucius"Neo-Confucianism" is the name commonly applied to the revival of the various strands of Confucian philosophy and political culture that began in the middle of the 9th century and reached new levels of intellectual and social creativity in the 11th century in the Northern Song Dynasty. The first phase of the revival of the Confucian tradition was completed by the great philosopher Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and became the benchmark for all future Confucian intellectual discourse and social theory. Especially after the Song, the Neo-Confucian movement included speculative philosophers, painters, poets, doctors, social ethicists, political theorists, historians, local reformers and government civil servants. By the 14th Century Zhu's version of Confucian thought, known as daoxue or the teaching of the way or lixue or the teaching of principle, became the standard curriculum for the imperial civil service examination system. The Neo-Confucian dominance of the civil service continued until the whole system was abolished in 1905.

The greatest challenge to Zhu Xi's initial synthesis of the various themes and praxis of daoxue was presented by the great Ming philosopher, poet, general, and civil servant, Wang Yangming (1472-1529). Wang, while continuing many of the characteristic practices of the movement, argued for a different philosophical interpretation and cultivation of the xin or mind-heart, so much so that Wang's distinctive philosophy is known as xinxue or the teaching of the mind-heart in order to distinguish it from Zhu's teaching of principle. In the Qing Dynasty (1644-1911) there was a further reaction against the speculative philosophy of both Zhu and Wang and the movement known as hanxue of the learning of Han [Dynasty] arose to combat what were taken to be the grave mistakes of both Zhu and Wang. This last great Chinese Neo-Confucian movement is also know as the school of evidential research because of its commitment to historical and philological research in contradistinction to the Song and Ming fascination with speculative metaphysics and personal moral self-cultivation.

It is important to remember that along with being highly philosophical, the Neo-Confucian masters where also teachers of various forms of personal moral self-cultivation. From the Neo-Confucian perspective, merely abstract knowledge was useless unless conjoined with ethical self reflection and cultivation that eventuated in proper moral behavior and social praxis. The Neo-Confucians sought to promote a unified vision of humane flourishing that would end with a person becoming a sage or worthy by means of various forms of self-cultivation.

It is also vital to remember that Neo-Confucianism became an international movement and spread to Korea, Japan, and Vietnam. Neo-Confucianism flourished in all of these East Asian countries and since the 16th Century some of most creative philosophical work was achieved in Korea and Japan.

In the 20th Century, even amidst the tremendous political and military upheavals throughout the East Asian region, there was yet another revival movement based on Neo-Confucianism now known as New Confucianism. While the New Confucian movement is clearly an heir of its Neo-Confucian past, it is also deeply engaged in dialogue with Western philosophy and is emerging as fascinating form of global philosophy at the beginning of the 21st Century.

Table of Contents

  1. Defining the Confucian Way
  2. Historical Background
    1. The Classical Period
    2. The Han Dynasty
    3. The Daoist Revival and the Arrival of Buddhism
  3. The Emergence of Neo-Confucianism
  4. Traits, Themes and Motifs
  5. Song and Ming Paradigms: daoxue or “Teaching of the Way”
    1. Zhu Xi’s Synthesis
    2. Song and Ming Rebuttals of daoxue
    3. Wang Yangming
    4. The Role of Emotion
    5. Evidential Research
  6. Korean and Japanese Contributions
    1. Yi T’oegye and Yi Yulgok
    2. Kaibara Ekken
  7. The Legacy of Neo-Confucianism
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Defining the Confucian Way

Before we explore the revival of Confucian learning throughout East Asia, we need to reflect on just what was being revived. Prior to the emergence of the “Neo-Confucian” thinkers, the Confucian tradition already had a long and distinguished tradition of commentary on the teachings of the famous teachers from the legendary past into the historical world of the Warring States and later.

The English labels “Confucianism” and “Neo-Confucianism” imply a close connection to the life and thought of Master Kong or Kongzi (Confucius), whose traditional dates are 551-479 BCE. If the term “Neo-Confucianism” is considered problematic because of its modern origin, its ancestor, “Confucianism,” is likewise imprecise and without a clear reference in traditional East Asian philosophical usage. Critical scholars have pointed out that there is no single Chinese, Korean, Japanese or Vietnamese traditional term that matches “Confucianism.” The closest term would be the hallowed Chinese designation of ru or scholar. Some have suggested that Confucianism should be renamed, they have suggested Ruism or the Ruist tradition; they point out that this would match more closely what Master Kong thought he was doing in teaching about the glories of Zhou culture. The problem is that ru originally meant a scholar of ritual tradition and not just followers of Master Kong. While it is true that, by the Song dynasty, ru did indeed come to mean a “Confucian” as opposed to Daoist or Buddhist scholars, this was not the case in the classical period. Therefore, it is true that all “Confucians” were ru, although not all ru scholars were followers of Master.

As we shall see, the use of the term “Neo-Confucian” is confusing and needs some careful revision. By Song times, there are some perfectly good Chinese terms that can be used to define the work of these later Confucian masters. There are a number of terms in use after the Song such as ru or classical scholar, daoxue or learning of the way, lixue or the teaching of principle, xingxue or teaching of the mind-heart, or hanxue or Han learning just to name a few. All of these schools fit into the Western definition of Confucianism, but the use of a single name for all of them obscures the critical differences that East Asian scholars believe are stipulated by the diverse Chinese nomenclature. While Confucians did almost always recognize each other across sectarian divides, they were passionately concerned to differentiate between good and bad versions of the Confucian Way.

Is it possible to provide a perfect and succinct definition of the Confucian Way? Modern critical scholars are extremely wary of any hegemonic set of essential criteria to define something as vast and diverse as the Confucian Way in all its diverse East Asian forms. For instance, is the Confucian tradition to be defined as an East Asian philosophical discourse or is it better understood as one of China’s indigenous religious wisdom teachings? Or is the Confucian Way something entirely different from what would be included or excluded by the criteria of the Western concepts of philosophy or religion?

Notwithstanding such proper scholarly reticence, two contemporary Confucian philosophers, Xu Fuguan and Mou Zongsan, have offered a suggestion about at least one sustaining and comprehensive motif that suffuses Confucian thought from the classical age to its modern revivals. First, Xu and Mou argue that Confucianism has always generated and sustained a profound social and ethical dimension to its philosophical and social praxis. This kind of commitment has lead many western scholars to define Confucianism as an axiological philosophical sensibility, a worldview ranging from social ethics to an inspired aesthetics. Second, accepting for a moment the axiological nature of much Confucian discourse, Xu and Mou give such philosophic reflections a particular name and call this informing motif of the Confucian Way “concern consciousness.” First, concern consciousness speaks of the perennial Confucian “concern” for proper social relations and hence the tradition’s abiding interest in ethical reflection and ethically edifying ritual praxis. Secondly, concern consciousness is always set within a social context. For instance, Confucian teachers have often taught that the folk etymology of ren or humaneness makes the point of social nature of all proper Confucian action: humaneness is at least two people treating each other as they ought to in order to sustain human flourishing. Therefore Xu and Mou argue that all Confucian thinkers will eventually return to an explication of some form of “concern consciousness” when they are giving a robust and detailed explanation of the rich teachings of the Confucian Way. An unconcerned Confucian is an oxymoron. The content and context of their concern for the world and the Dao will vary dramatically, yet the sense of concern, of having a care as the Quakers taught on the other side of Eurasia, remains a hallmark of Confucian philosophical sensibilities.

2. Historical Background

The historical development of the Confucian Way or movement has been variously analyzed in terms of distinct periods. The simplest version is that there was a great classical tradition that arose in the Xia, Shang and Zhou kingdoms that was perfected in the works and records of the legendary sage kings and ministers and was then continued and refined by their later followers such as Kongzi, Mengzi (Mencius) and Xunzi. The death of Kongzi in 481 BCE marked the end of the Spring and Autumn periods of the Eastern Zhou kingdom and the beginning of the era called the Warring States period. On the one hand, although later Chinese thinkers decried the ceaseless interstate warfare that characterized the era, on the other hand the Warring States period is remembered as the most creative philosophical epoch in Chinese history. All of the great indigenous schools of Chinese philosophy find their origin in this period from 480 to 221 BCE when the Qin state finally unified the empire under the rule of the First Emperor of the Qin. After the incredible cultural efflorescence of the Warring States intellectuals, all future philosophical achievements were deemed to be commentary on the depositions of the classical masters.

Later scholars have suggested that this binary division of Chinese philosophical history is too simple and that there are three or more clear divisions for the Confucian movement because it has demonstrated a longevity and continuity of maturation for more than two thousand five hundred years. For instance, some modern scholars suggest that, based on creativity and transformation of the tradition, there was a three-fold division of the classical period, the Neo-Confucian movements of the Song, Yuan, Ming and Qing dynasties and most recently the era defined by the impact of the modern West on the East Asian philosophical and religious Confucian worlds. The most complex periodization differentiates the achievement of Confucian thinkers over the centuries more subtly than either the binary or triadic divisions allow. A strong case can be made for defining six discrete eras in the historical development of the Confucian tradition in East Asia:

  1. The classical period beginning in the Xia, Shang and Zhou kingdoms: includes the justly famous Warring States philosophers (c. 1700-221 BCE)
  2. The rise of the great commentarial traditions on early classical texts during the Han dynasty (206 BCE—200 CE)
  3. The renewal of the Daoist tradition and the arrival of Buddhism (220-907 CE)
  4. The renaissance of the Song [“Neo-Confucianism”], the flowering in the Yuan and Ming dynasties, and the spread of Neo-Confucianism into Korea and Japan (960-1644 CE)
  5. The “Han Studies” or “Evidential Research” movements of the Qing dynasty and the continued growth of the movement in Korea and Japan (1644-1911 CE)
  6. The impact of the West, the rise of modernity, and the decline and reformation of the Confucian Way as “New Confucianism” (1912 CE to the present)

In order to give a capsule outline of the development of Confucianism down to the rise of the great Neo-Confucian thinkers in the Song, what follows is a very short set of outlines of the first three of these six periods, which preceded the rise of Neo-Confucian movements. It is important to remember that although Confucianism began as a Chinese tradition it became an international movement throughout East Asia. A full understanding of Neo-Confucianism requires that attention be paid to its advancement in Korea, Japan and Vietnam along with the continuing unfolding of the tradition in China.

a. The Classical Period

According to Master Kong, there was a long and distinguished tradition of sage wisdom that stretched back even before the Xia and Shang dynasties. Master Kong sought to collect, edit and transmit these precious texts to his students in the hope that such an education project would lead to the renewed flourishing of the culture of humaneness based on the teachings of the sage kings and their ministers. Master Kong was followed by a stellar set of Confucian masters, the most important being Mengzi and Xunzi. These great Confucian masters not only argued among themselves about the nature of the Confucian way, they confronted the attacks of the other great schools and thinkers of the Warring States period. The texts attached to the names of these great scholars have served, along with the other early canonical material, to define the contours of the Confucian Way ever since the Warring States period.

While Master Kong would have rejected the notion that he founded or created a new tradition, it is to his Analects that countless generations of Confucians return to discover wisdom and insight into the nature of Confucian culture. Further, great teachers such as Master Meng and Master Xun continue to defend and refine the teachings of Master Kong in robust debate with the other schools of the Warring States period. Although there has always been skepticism about the claim for such authorship, traditional Confucian scholars held that Master Kong himself had an editorial role in the compilation of many of the canonical texts that became ultimately the Thirteen Confucian Classics.

b. The Han Dynasty

The Han dynasty contribution to the growth of the Confucian Way is often overshadowed by the grand achievements of the classical period. Yet the Han scholars edited almost all of the texts that survived and began to add their own critical commentaries and interpretations to the canonical texts. In many cases these Han commentaries are now recognized as classics in their own right. One of the features of the Confucian tradition is the use of various forms of commentaries as a vital philosophical genre. It is a period that reveres historical traditions and hence the commentary is viewed as a proper way to transmit the traditional learning.

c. The Daoist Revival and the Arrival of Buddhism

After the fall of the Han dynasty, there was a marked revival of various facets of the earlier Daoist traditions. The movement was called xuanxue or arcane or abstruse (profound) learning. Xuanxue thinkers were highly eclectic; sometimes they praised and used the great Warring States Daoist texts such as the Daodejing or the Zhuangzi to frame their complicated philosophical and religious visions, and sometimes they reframed materials drawn from the Confucian tradition as well. It is universally recognized that the great xuanxue scholars brought a new level of philosophical sophistication to their analysis of the classical and Han texts. Moreover, this was also the epoch of the emergence of the great Daoist religious traditions that mark the Chinese and East Asian landscape from this era down to the present day. The Daoist religious founders and reformers also claimed the early texts such as the Daodejing, Zhuangzi and the Yijing [The Book of Changes] as their patrimony.

The xuanxue revival was ultimately eclipsed by the arrival of Buddhism in China. The era stretching roughly from 200 to 850 marks the height of the influence of Buddhism on Chinese culture. Along with the translation of the immense Buddhist canon into Chinese, the scholar monks of this era also created the unique Chinese Buddhist schools that went on to dominate the religious life of East Asia. The Buddhists also introduced novel social institutions such as monastic communities for both men and women. Great Chinese schools of Buddhist philosophy and practice were founded, such as the Tiantai, Huayan, Pure Land and Chan traditions. In short, the impact on Chinese society and intellectual life was immense and shaped the future of Confucian philosophy.

It is very important to remember that Confucianism continued to play a vital and even creative role in the history of Chinese philosophy while Buddhism was ascendant. Confucianism never “disappeared” from sight and in fact continued to dominate elite family life and governmental service. Confucianism remained the preferred approach to political and social thought and much personal and communal ethical reflection was concurrent with the powerful contributions of Daoist and Buddhist thinkers.

3. The Emergence of Neo-Confucianism

Both traditional and modern historians of China mark the year 755 CE as the great divide within the Tang dynasty. This was the year of the catastrophic An Lushan rebellion and although the Tang dynasty formally lasted until its final demise in 906, it never recovered its full glory. And glorious the Tang was; it is the dynasty always remembered as one of the high points of Chinese imperial history in terms of political, military, artistic, philosophical and religious creativity. For instance, it was the flourishing and cosmopolitan culture of the Tang world—with everything from metaphysics to painting, calligraphy, poetry, food and clothes—that spread throughout East Asia into the emerging societies of Korea and Japan. Moreover, while the Tang is noted as the golden age of Buddhist philosophical originality in terms of the formation of important Chinese schools such as the Tiantai, Huayan, Pure Land and Chan [Zen in Japanese pronunciation], a number of important Confucian thinkers began to challenge the intellectual and philosophical supremacy of Buddhism.

Three great Confucian scholars stand out as the earliest “Neo-Confucians”: Han Yu (768-824), Li Ao (ca. 772-836) and Liu Zongyuan (773-819). All three scholars launched a double-pronged attack on Buddhism and a concomitant appeal for the restoration and revival of the Confucian Way. Just after the deaths of this trio of Confucian scholars, a late Tang emperor began a major persecution of Buddhism. Although not a bloody event as persecutions of religions go, many major schools failed to revive fully after 845 and this date, along with the earlier rebellion of An Lushan, marks dramatic changes in the philosophical landscape of China.

Along with his friends Han Yu and Li Ao, Liu Zongyuan was regarded as one of the most famous scholars of his time. Liu is perhaps more of a bridging figure between the early and later Tang intellectual worlds, but he still expressed a number of highly consistent Neo-Confucian themes and did so with a style that links him forward to the Song masters. For instance, Liu, unlike many earlier Tang Confucians, was interested in finding what he thought to be the principles expounded in the classic texts rather than a convoluted, arcane if compendious commentarial exegesis. He searched for the true meaning of the sages in the texts and not merely to study the philological subtlety of traditional commentarial lore. Further, Liu passionately believed that the authentic Dao was to be found in antiquity, by which he meant the true ideals of the Confucian teachings of the early sages. Along with this commitment to finding the confirmed teachings of the sages in the historical records, Liu was committed to political engagement based on these sage teachings. Like all the later Neo-Confucians, Liu asserted the need to apply Confucian ethical norms and insights to political and social life.

Han Yu is considered to be the most important and innovative of the Tang Confucian reformers. He was a true renaissance man; he was an important political figure, brilliant essayist, Confucian philosopher and anti-Buddhist polemicist. What gives his work such power is that he carried out his various roles with a unified vision in mind: the defense and restoration of the Confucian Way.

In order to restore the Confucian Way, Han Yu developed a program of reform and renewal manifested in a literary movement called guwen or the ancient prose movement. But Han was doing much more than simply calling for a return to a more elegant prose style. He was urging this reform in order to clarify the presentation of the ideas of the Confucian tradition that was needlessly obscured by the arcane writing styles of the current age. He wanted to write clearly in order to express the plain truth of the Confucian Way. Moreover, Han stressed a profound self-cultivation of the Dao. In order to do so, Han accentuated the image of the sage as the proper role model for humane self-cultivation. And last, but certainly not least, Han and his colleagues proposed a Confucian canon-within-the-canon of a select set of texts that especially facilitate such a quest, namely such works as The Doctrine of the Mean, The Great Learning, the Analects and the Mengzi .

Along with his reform of the style and canon of the teaching of the Confucian Way, Han also explained his philosophical program in terms of the vocabulary and sensibility of the later Song Neo-Confucian revival. As Han put it, the sage seeks “to develop one’s nature to perfection through the penetration of principle” or qiongli jinxing. Han himself wrote in an exegesis of a passage in the Analects in the examinations of 794:

Answer: The sage embraces integrity (cheng) and enlightenment (ming) as his true nature (zhengxing); he takes as his base the perfect virtue; this is equilibrium and harmony (zhongyong). He generates (fa) these inside and gives them form outside; they do not proceed from thought, yet all is in order. This mind [-heart] set on evil has no way to develop in him, and preferable behavior cannot be applied to him; so only the Sage commits no errors (Hartman 1986: 201).

Han Yu’s friend Li Ao shared similar views and wrote a highly influential essay on human nature that sounded more of the philosophic themes that would dominate the Song Neo-Confucian revival. While Li’s vision of the self might be a bit too quiescent for the tastes of the more activist Song literati, it still captured the tone of the philosophical revival:

Therefore it is sincerity that the sage takes as his nature, absolutely still and without movement, vast and great, clear and bright, shining on Heaven and Earth. When stimulated he can then penetrate all things in the world. In act or in rest, in speech or silence, he always remains in the ultimate. It is returning to his true nature that the worthy man follows without ceasing. If he follows it without ceasing he is enabled to get back to the source (Barrett 1992: 102).

In many ways it was this attempt to “get back to the source” in the classical Confucian texts that characterizes the philosophical endeavors of the Song, Yuan, Ming and Qing masters. There is a continuous debate about what this nature is, whether it is in constant movement or is still; what “the ultimate” ultimately is or what the nature of the source of all of this is.

4. Traits, Themes and Motifs

One of the most common assumptions about the philosophical achievements of the Neo-Confucian literati is that it was stimulated into life by interaction with Daoist and Buddhist thinkers. While there is a genuine element of truth in this stimulus theory of the origins of Neo-Confucianism, it is also true that, once prompted by the best of Daoist and Buddhist thought, the Neo-Confucians constructed their philosophies out of materials indigenous to the historical development of the Confucian Way. For instance, I have chosen to call this historical background the Confucian Way (rudao) because this was the concept used by the great Song masters. They argued that they were not inventing something new but were rather reviving “this culture of ours” as the true Dao of the sage kings of antiquity as transmitted by Master Kong and Master Meng. Yet the materials, the traits, concepts, themes and motifs the Song masters used in reconstructing the Confucian Way were drawn almost exclusively from the classical repertoire. These concepts, traits, themes and terms include:

  1. Ren as the paramount virtue and marker for all the other virtues such as justice/yi, ritual action/li, wisdom or discernment/zi and faithfulness/xin; these five constant virtues provide the axiological sensibility to the whole Neo-Confucian enterprise; these are linked to filial piety/xiao as an expression of primordial familial relationships.
  2. Li as ritual action; the social glue that holds society together and in fact helps to constitute the humane person.
  3. Tian or heaven and tianming or the Mandate of Heaven; di or earth; whether we should use a capital “H” for tian is an important question for the Neo-Confucian philosophy of religion; Tian, di and ren or heaven, earth and human beings form an important cosmological triad for the Neo-Confucians.
  4. Li as principle, pattern or order to the whole of the cosmos; a key Song philosophic term as a little used early Confucian concept.
  5. Xin or the mind-heart; the living center of the human person; needs to be cultivated by proper ritual in order to realize true virtue.
  6. Xing or human tendencies, dispositions or nature; this is the principle/li given to each emerging person by tian as the mandate for what the person ought to be.
  7. Qi or vital force or material force that functions as the dynamic force or matrix out of which all object or events emerge and into which they all return when their career is completed.
  8. Qing as emotion, desire and passion; intimately related to qi/vital force as the dynamic side of the cosmos.
  9. Dao wenxue & zun dexing or serious study and reflection or honoring the moral tendencies or dispositions as designations of two different ways of cultivating the xin/mind-heart and as contrasting modes of moral epistemology.
  10. gewu or the investigation of things was a key [and highly contested] epistemological methodology for the examination of the concrete objects and events of the world.
  11. Cheng or sincerity, genuineness and the self-actualization of the moral virtues such that one achieves a morally harmonious life via various forms of xiushen or self-cultivation by means of such praxis as jing mindfulness or attentiveness; this praxis is the “how” of the moral self-cultivation of the five constant virtues.
  12. Nei/wai as the inner and outer dimensions of any process; often also used for the “king without, sage within”; often also discussed in terms of the opposition of si/selfishness and pian/partiality or one-sidedness and gong of public spirit.
  13. tiyong or substance and function and ganying or stimulus and response as typical analytic dyads used to describe the reactive movement, generations, productions and emergence of the objects and events of the cosmos.
  14. liyi fenshu or the teaching that principle is one or unified while its manifestations are many or diverse; often seen as the characteristic holistic organic sensibility and yet realistic pluralism of Neo-Confucian thought.
  15. daotong or the Transmission of the Way or Succession, or Genealogy of the Way; Zhu Xi’s masterful account of the revival of the Confucian Way by a set of Northern Song philosophical masters.
  16. siwen or “this culture of ours” as the expression of refined self-cultivation and the manifestation of principle from the family to the cosmos.
  17. He or harmony and zhong or centrality as designations of the goals or outcomes of the successful cultivation of all the virtues necessary for humane flourishing.
  18. zhishan or the highest good as the realization of harmony and centrality; the ideal would be to become a sheng or sage (theoretically possible but in practice extremely difficult) or a junzi, a worthy or noble person.
  19. Taiji or the Supreme Polarity or Supreme Ultimate as the highest formal trait of the principle of the whole cosmos and for each particular thing; often discussed in terms of benti or the origin-substance or substance and source of all objects and events.
  20. Dao or the perfect good of all that is, will or can be; the totality of the cosmos as the shengsheng buxi or generation without cessation; also usually implies a moral “more” to the myriad things of the cosmos.

5. Song and Ming Paradigms: daoxue or “Teaching of the Way”

Zhu Xi’s (1130-1200) version of and description of the revival of Confucian thought formed the paradigm for the main philosophical developments that give rise to the Western notion of Neo-Confucianism and the variety of East Asian designations of the various Song movements such as daoxue. Other thinkers would adopt, modify, challenge, transform and sometimes abandon Zhu’s philosophy and his narrative of the development of the tradition; nonetheless, it is Zhu’s version of the Confucian Way that became the paradigm for all future Neo-Confucian discourse for either positive affirmation or negative evaluation. It is Master Zhu who also provides the philosophical interpretation of the rise of Neo-Confucianism that defines the historical accounts of the tradition from the Southern Song on. In short, Zhu’s theory of the daotong or the transmission or succession (genealogy) of the Way not only provides the content for the tradition but also the historical context for its further analysis by partisans and critics in the Yuan, Ming and Qing dynasties.

Zhu Xi inherited the rich complexity of the revival of Confucian thought from a variety of Northern Song masters. In organizing this heritage into an enduring synthesis, Zhu was highly selective in his choices about who he placed in the daotong or the succession of the way or the true teachings drawn from the legendary sages; historical paladins such as the Kings Wen, Wu and the Duke of Zhou, and then Master Kong and Master Meng as the consummate philosophers of the classical age. It is always important to remember that the Song cultural achievement is much broader then Zhu’s favored short list of Northern Song masters. Anyone interested in the history of Song Confucian thought will need to pay careful attention to thinkers as diverse as the Northern Song scholars and activists such as Fan Zhongyan (989-1052), Ouyang Xiu (1007-1072), Wang Anshi (1021-1086), Sima Guang (1019-1086), Su Shi (10-37-1101) and Southern Song colleagues and critics of Zhu such as Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Chen Liang (1143-1194)—just to give a short list of major Song philosophers, scholars, politicians, historians, social critics and poets.

Zhu Xi’s own list included Zhou Tunyi (1017-1073), Zhang Zai (1020-1077), Cheng Hao (1032-1085) and Cheng Yi (1033-1107) [and though not canonized by Zhu, any such list would be incomplete without recognition of Shao Yong (1011-1077)]. Each one of these thinkers, according to Zhu, contributed important material for the recovery of “this culture of ours” and to the formation of daoxue as the appropriate Confucian teaching of the Song cultural renaissance. Zhu’s unique contribution to the process was to give philosophical order to the disparate contributions of the Northern Song masters.

a. Zhu Xi’s Synthesis

What Zhu Xi did was to give a distinctive ordering to the kinds of terms listed above; he gave them a pattern that became the philosophical foundation of daoxue. For those who disagreed, such as Lu Xiangshan and the later Ming thinker Wang Yangming (1472-1529), Zhu provided the template of Song thought that must be modified, transformed or even rejected, but never ignored.

The most famous innovation Zhu provided, based on the original insights of the two Cheng brothers and Zhang Zai was to frame daoxue philosophy via the complicated cosmological interaction of principle/li and vital force/qi. To understand Zhu’s argument, we must consider how the question of the relationship of principle and vital force presented itself to Zhu Xi as a philosophical problem in need of a solution. Zhu understood his analysis of principle and vital force to be the answer to the question of interpreting the relationship of the human mind-heart, human natural tendencies and the emotions. Trying to resolve how all of this fit together, Zhu borrowed a critical teaching of Zhang Zai to the effect that the mind-heart unifies the human tendencies and the emotions. Zhu then went on to claim that analytically understood this meant that the principle qua human tendencies or dispositions gave a particular order or pattern to the emerging person and that the dyad of principle and vital force coordinated and unified the actions of the mind-heart. In other words, Zhu discerned a tripartite patterning or principle of the emergence of the person, and by extension, all the other objects or events of the world in terms of form or principle, dynamics or vital force and their unification via the mind-heart: the mature schematic is form, dynamics and unification. Moreover, once this unification of the principle and vital force was achieved and perfected, the outcome, at least for the human person, was a state of harmony or balance.

Zhu’s ingenious synthesis, to which he gave the name daoxue or teaching of the way, accomplished two different ends. First, its breadth of vision provided Confucians with a response to the great philosophical achievements of the Chinese Buddhist schools such as the Tiantai or Huayan. Second, and more important, it outlined a Confucian cosmological axiology based upon the classical Confucian texts of the pre-Han era as well as an explanation for and analysis of the coming to be of the actual objects or events of the world. Zhu achieved this feat by showing how all the various concepts of the inherited Confucian philosophical vocabulary could be construed in three different modalities based on the pattern of form, dynamics and unification.

For instance, the analysis of the human person was very important for Zhu Xi. Each person was an allotment of vital force generated by union of the parents. Along with this allotment of qi or vital force, each person inherited a set of natural tendencies or what has often been called human nature. The subtlest portion of the vital force becomes the mind-heart for each person. The mind-heart has both cognitive and affective abilities; when properly cultivated, the mind-heart, for instance, can recognize the various principles inherent in its own nature and the nature of other objects and events. And when subject to proper education and self-cultivation, the mind-heart can even learn to correctly discern the various is/ought contrasts found in the world in order to sustain human flourishing via ethical action. In short, the mind-heart, as the experiential unity of concern consciousness becomes the human agent for creative and humane reason. The most pressing human is/ought contrast is that between the nature of principle as the ethical tendencies of human nature and the dynamic flux of human emotions that are governed, without proper self-cultivation, by selfishness and one-sidedness. There is nothing evil in an Augustinian sense of the human emotions save for the fact that they are much too prone to excess without the guidance of principle.

When asked to give an analytic account of this portrait of the human person, Zhu Xi then noted that this was to be explained by recourse to the concepts of the particular principle for each object or event, vital force of each such object or event and the normative or “heavenly mandate” of each object or event, which Zhu Xi called the Supreme Ultimate or Polarity. The whole system was predicated on the daoxue conviction of the ultimate moral tendency of the Dao to regulate the creative structure of the ceaseless production of the objects and events of the world. The world was thus to be seen as endlessly creative and relentlessly realistic in the sense that this cosmic creativity of the Dao eventuated in the concrete objects and events of the world.

The experiential world of the human mind-heart and the analytic schema of the unification of principle and vital force could also be described by the use of classical Confucian selective or mediating concepts such as cheng or self-actualization of jen or ultimate humanization as the paramount human ethical norm. Cheng and jen provide the modes of self-actualization and the methods of self-cultivation of the various emotional dispositions that give moral direction to the person when the person is grasped by a proper recognition of the various is/ought contrasts that inevitably arise in the conduct of human life. Hence the concern-consciousness of the person is the basis of individual creativity and manifests the particular principle of the mandate of heaven in a specific time and place for each person. Cosmic creativity or the ceaseless production of the objects and events of the cosmos replicates itself in the life of the person, and when properly actualized or integrated, can cause the person to find the harmony and balance of a worthy or even a sage. Thus even Zhu Xi’s explanation of the role of formal analysis, the arising of the existential manifestation of human nature and human emotion via the various mediating or selective concepts appropriate to the various levels of abstract or concrete determination itself takes on a carefully crafted triadic structure that manifests the proper discernment of the various dyadic conceptual pairs so evident in classical Confucian discourse. Both the tensions of the contrasting pairs such as nature and emotion are preserved and yet re-inscribed in the various allotments of the qi of each of the objects or events of the cosmos with a vision of their harmonious and balanced creative interaction. Zhu’s world is truly one of liyi fenshu or principle is one [unitary], whereas the manifestations are many.

Zhu Xi was equally famous for this theory of the praxis of the self-cultivation of the ultimately moral axiology of his multi-level system of philosophical analysis. His preferred method was that of gewu or the investigation of things. Zhu Xi believed that all the objects and events of the world had their own distinctive principle and that it was important for the student to study and comprehend as many of these principles as possible. It was a method of intellectual cultivation of the mind-heart that included both introspection and respect for external empirical research. In many respects, gewu was an attempt toward finding an objective and inter-subjective method to overcome pian or the perennial human disinclination to be one-sided, partial or blinkered in any form of thought, action and passion. In Zhu’s daoxue a great deal of emphasis was placed on reading and discerning the true meaning the Confucian classics, but there was also room in the praxis for a form of meditation known as quiet-sitting as well as empirical research into the concrete facts of the external world. The debates about the proper way to pursue self-cultivation and the examination of things proved to be one of the most highly debated sets of interrelated philosophical concerns throughout the Neo-Confucian world.

b. Song and Ming Rebuttals of daoxue

In terms of philosophical debate about the worthiness of daoxue, there was a great deal of disagreement about a variety of issues in the Song, Yuan, Ming and Qing dynasties. The Qing scholars were the most radical in their critique and merit a separate section; however, there were immediate Song dynasty rejoinders to Zhu Xi who argued against part of the synthesis on philosophical grounds. The first major rebuttal came from Zhu’s friend and critic Chen Liang (1143-1194), one of the great utilitarian philosophers of the Confucian tradition. What worried Chen about Zhu’s daoxue was that it was too idealistic and hence not suited to the actual geopolitical demands of the Southern Song reality. While it is clear that Zhu was passionately involved in the politics of his day, Chen contended that the world was a more empirically complex place than Zhu’s system implied. “I simply don’t agree with [your] joining together principles and [complex] affairs [as neatly and artificially] as if they were barrel hoops” (Tillman 1994: 52).

The nub of the debate revolved around the proper understanding of the notion of “public” or gong, gongli, public benefit. Here Chen broke with Zhu and suggested that good laws were needed just as good Neo-Confucian philosophers trained in a metaphysical praxis such as daoxue. “The human mind-heart (xin) is mostly self-regarding, but laws and regulations (fa) can be used to make it public-minded (gong)….Law and regulations comprise the collective or commonweal principle (gongli)” (Tillman 1994:16).

Such arguments for pragmatic political theory and even an appeal to the beneficial outcomes of carefully constructed legal regimes were never well received in the Neo-Confucian period, even if they did point to some genuinely diverse views within the Song Confucian revivals.

The most influential critique of Zhu Xi’s daoxue also came from another good friend, Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193). The crux of the philosophical disagreement resides in Lu’s different interpretation of the role of the mind-heart in terms of the common Neo-Confucian task of finding the right method for evaluating the moral epistemology of interpreting the world correctly. In a dialogue with a student, Lu pinpointed his argument with Zhu:

Bomin asked: How is one to investigate things (gewu)?

The Teacher (Lu Xiangshan) said: Investigate the principle of things.

Bomin said: The ten thousand things under Heaven are extremely multitudinous; how, then, can we investigate all of them exhaustively?

The teacher replied: The ten thousand things are already complete in us. It is only necessary to apprehend their principle (Huang 1977: 31).

There are two important things to notice about Lu’s critical response to the question of the examination of things. First, in many ways Lu does not disagree with the basic cosmological outline provided by Zhu Xi. Second, the philosophic sensibility, however, becomes even more focused on the internal self-cultivation of the person. Many scholars have remarked upon the fact that we find a turn inward in so much Song and Ming philosophy, and none more so than in Lu’s intense desire to find principle within the person. Of course, this is not to be understood as a purely subjective idealism. Rather, Lu would argue that only by finding principle in the mind-heart could the person then effectively comprehend the rest of the world. The point is not a solipsistic retreat into subjective and relativistic reveries of isolated individuality but rather a heightened ability to interpret and engage the world as it really is. The critical question is to find the proper place to start the investigation of things. If we start with the things of the world, we fall prey to the problems of self-delusion and partiality that infect the uncultivated person. But if we can find the correct place and method to investigate things and comprehend their principles, then we will understand the actual, concrete unity of principle.

c. Wang Yangming

Centuries later in the mid-Ming dynasty, Wang Yangming (1472-1529) sharpened what he took to be Lu’s critique of Zhu Xi. Wang’s philosophy was inextricably intertwined with of his eventful life. Wang also had the richest life of any of the major Neo-Confucian philosophers: he was a philosopher of major import, a poet, a statesman and an accomplished general. Wang began as a young student by attempting to follow Zhu’s advice about how to gewu or investigate things. With a group of naïve young friends they went into a garden to sit in front of some bamboos in order to discern the true principle of bamboo. The band of young scholars obviously thought that this would be an easy task. One by one they fell away, unable to make any progress in their quest to understand bamboo principle. Wang was the last to give up and only did so after having exhausted himself in the futile effort. Wang recounts that he simply believed that he lacked the moral and intellectual insight to carry out the task at hand; at this time he did not question Zhu’s master narrative about how to engage the world as a Confucian philosopher.

Later during a painful political exile in the far south of China, Wang Yangming had a flash of insight into the problem of finding the true location of principle. As Tu Weiming writes, “For the first time Yangming came to the realization that “My own nature is, of course, sufficient for me to attain sagehood. And I have been mistaken in searching for the li [principle] in external things and affairs [shiwu]” (Tu 1976: 120). Wang clearly understood this enlightenment experience as a confirmation that Lu Xiangshan was correct when Lu had declared that principle was to be found complete within the mind-heart of the person. In much greater detail than Lu, Wang then set out to develop the philosophical implications of the primordial insight into the proper way to carry out Confucian moral epistemology and self-cultivation. And after having straightened out the epistemology, Wang then went on to explain how the Confucian worthy should act in the world. This strong emphasis on the cultivation of the mind-heart led to the categorization of Wang’s teaching as a xinxue or teaching of the mind-heart as opposed to Zhu’s lixue or teaching of principle, and, in fact, this is the way later scholars often labeled the teachings of Zhu and Wang.

The way Wang taught about the task of realizing what he called the innate goodness of human nature was his famous doctrine of the unity of knowledge and action. As Wang said, “Knowledge is the direction for action and action is the effort for knowledge” and “Knowledge is the beginning of action and action is the completion of knowledge” (Ching 1976: 68). The problem that Wang was addressing was the deep concern that Zhu’s method for examining things in order to cultivate the essential goodness of the mind-heart was too fragmented and that such epistemological fragmentation would eventuate in moral failure and cognitive incompetence. Real praxis and theory could not be separated, and even if Wang acknowledged that Zhu was a sincere seeker after the Dao, Wang believed that Zhu’s methods were hopelessly flawed and actually dangerous to the cultivation of the Confucian worthy.

d. The Role of Emotion

There was yet another philosophical realignment within Ming thought that is harder to identify with the specific teachings of any one master, namely the debate over the role of qing or emotion within the Neo-Confucian world of discourse [representative scholars would be Li Zhi (1527-1602) and Ho Xingyin (1517-1579)]. The nature of the emotions or human feelings was always a topic of reflection within the broad sweep of the historical development of Confucianism because of the persistent Confucian fascination with moral anthropology and ethics. Zhu Xi had a very important place for the emotions in his teachings of the way, though many later thinkers felt that Zhu was too negative about the function of the emotions. While it was perfectly clear that Zhu never taught that the emotions per se were evil or entirely negative, he did teach that the emotions needed to be properly and carefully cultivated in terms of the conformity of the emotional life to the life of principle. Zhu thematized this as the contrast between the daoxin or the Mind of Dao and the renxin or the Mind of Humanity (the mind of the psychophysical person). Moreover, it was also perfectly clear that Zhu taught that the truly ethical person needed to realize the Mind of Dao in order to actualize the human tendencies as mandated by heaven for each person. If not hostile to the emotions, Zhu was wary of them as the prime location for human self-centered and partial behavior.

By the late Ming dynasty many of the followers of Wang Yangming harshly questioned what they took to be the negative Song teachings about the emotional life. In fact, many of these thinkers made the bold claim that the emotions were just as important and valuable philosophical resources for authentic Confucian teachings as reflections on the themes of principle or vital force. In fact, they contended that it was a proper and positive interpretation of human emotions and even passions that distinguishes Confucianism from Daoism and Buddhism. Whether or not these thinkers were correct in their interpretations of Daoist and Buddhist thought need not detain us here. What is more important is that these thinkers developed a more positive interpretation of qing than had been the case in earlier Song and Ming thought. It might be argued that such a concern for the emotions was just another marker of the Neo-Confucian turn toward the subject, a flight to contemplation of an inner subjective world as opposed to the much more activist style of the Han and Tang scholarly traditions. However, this speculation about emotion, even romantic love, had the unintended effect of allowing educated Chinese women to enter into the debate. Debarred, as they noted, from active lives outside the literati family compounds, the women observed that although living circumscribed lives compared to their fathers, brothers, husbands and sons, they did know something about the emotions—and that they had something positive to add to the debate.

Dorothy Ko’s important study of the role of educated women tells the wonderful and poignant story of three young women, Chan Tong (ca. 1650-1665), Tan Ze (ca. 1655-1675) and Qian Yi (fl. 1694). All three were eventually the wives of Wu Ren, with Chan and Tan dying very early in life and leaving what would be called the Three Wives Commentary on the famous Ming drama The Peony Pavilion to be completed and published in 1694 by the third wife, Madame Qian. The three women demonstrated just as great scholarly exegetical and hermeneutic skills as their husband, and he always acknowledged their authorship and their collective and individual genius against those who thought women unable to achieve this level of cultural, artistic and philosophical sophistication. In short, the three women defended and explicated the theory about human emotions, also held by the radical Taizhou school followers of Wang Yangming, that even the entangled emotions of romantic love could become “a noble sentiment that gives meaning of human life” (Ko 1994:84). Although not widely accepted in late Ming and Qing society, these Confucian women defended the notion of companionate marriage based, in part, on a Confucian analysis of the emotional needs of women and men.

e. Evidential Research

After the conquest of all of China by the Manchu in 1644, there was a tremendous cultural backlash against the radical thinkers of the late Ming dynasty. Rather than seeking validation of the emotions and human passions, many Qing scholars took a completely different approach to rediscover the true teachings of the classical Confucian sages. The point of departure for all of these thinkers was to reject the philosophical foundations of both Song scholars such as Zhu Xi and Ming teachers such as Wang Yangming. The charge the radical Qing scholars made against both Zhu and Wang Yangming was that both lixue and xinxue were completely infused with so much extraneous Daoist and Buddhist accretions that the true Confucian vision was subverted into something strange to the teachings of the classical Confucian masters. Therefore, the task of the Qing scholars was to strip Neo-Confucianism of its Daoist and Buddhist subversive inclusions.

The method that the Qing scholars chose has been called hanxue or Han Teaching or kaozhengxue, Evidential Research Learning. The chief tactic was to argue that the best way to return to true Confucian teachings in the face of Song Neo-Confucian distortions was to return to the work of the earliest stratum of texts, namely the work of the famous Han exegetes. The theory was that these Han scholars were closer to the classical texts and were also without the taint of undue Daoist or Buddhist influence. The other way to describe the movement is to note that these scholars promoted a various rigorous historical-critical and philological approach to the philosophical texts based on what they called an evidential research program. The grand axiom or rubric of the kaozhengxue scholars was to find the truth in the facts. They abjured what they believed to be the overly metaphysical flights of fancy of the Song and Ming thinkers and went back to the careful study of philology and textual and social history in order to return to a true Confucian scholarly culture. The better philosophers of this group, with Ku Yanwu (1613-1682) and Dai Zhen (1724-1777) as the bookends of the tradition, recognized that such an appeal to research methodology as opposed to Song metaphysics was also a philosophical appeal in its own right. Yet all these Evidential Research scholars were united in trying to find the earliest core of true Confucian texts by a meticulous examination of the whole history of Confucian thought. Along with major contributions to Confucian classical studies, these Evidential Research philosophers also made major additions to the promotion of local historical studies and even advanced practical studies in agriculture and water management. They really did try to find the truth in the facts. Yet the world of the Qing Evidential Research scholars was as ruthlessly destroyed as the metaphysical speculations of Song-style philosophers with the arrival of the all-powerful Western imperial powers in the middle of the 19th century.

6. Korean and Japanese Contributions

It is extremely important to remember that Neo-Confucianism was an international and cross-cultural tradition in East Asia, with different manifestations in China, Korea, Japan and Vietnam. For instance, a strong case can be made for the strong philosophical creativity of Korean Neo-Confucians in the 15th and 16th centuries and in Japan after the inception of Tokugawa rule in 1600. Two examples will have to suffice to demonstrate that in some eras the most stimulating and innovative Confucian philosophical work was being done in Korea and Japan. As mentioned above, little study has been devoted to the Vietnamese reception and appropriation of Neo-Confucian philosophy at that time, and thus it is still impossible to speak with as much confidence about it as we can about the creativity of the Korean and Japanese Neo-Confucian philosophers.

a. Yi T’oegye and Yi Yulgok

The Korean Neo-Confucians who practiced the official ideology of the Choson kingdom after its founding in 1392 were devoted followers of Zhu Xi’s daoxue. But just because they were profound students of Master Zhu’s Southern Song Neo-Confucian synthesis does not mean that they did not realize that there were still a number of outstanding philosophical issues that needed to be debated in terms of how Zhu Xi depicted the daoxue project as a coherent philosophical vision. The most famous case of this Korean perspicacity is found in the justly famous Four-Seven Debate, a profound dialogue among scholars about the role of emotions within Zhu’s Neo-Confucian cosmology; the two most famous philosophers were Yi T’oegye (1501-1570) and Yi Yulgok (1536-1583).

The debate was framed as a technical discussion of two different lists of emotions (one list of four and another of seven different emotions, and hence the name for the Four-Seven Debate) inherited from the classical Confucian texts. But the most interesting underlying philosophical issues that emerged had to do with the analysis of the nature of and relationship between principle and vital force. In short, the Korean scholars realized that as elegant as it might be, there were problems with Zhu’s account of the nature of principle. The problem was put this way in a famous metaphor: how could a dead rider (principle as a purely formal pattern) guide the living horse of vital force? In other words, the Korean scholars understood clearly that the whole sensibility of the daoxue project was suffused with an emphasis on cosmic process. Hence, if process was so essential to the working of Zhu’s system, how could principle, as a critical philosophical trait, itself be without the living creativity of process? In the words of the Yijing or Book of Changes, if the very spirit of the Dao is shengsheng buxi or the generation [of the myriad things] without cessation, then how does this notion of genuine cosmological creativity inform the proper interpretation of principle as the key trait of the formal side of Zhu’s master narrative?

Yi Yulgok, the younger of the two giants of Korean Neo-Confucianism, gave the most creative response to this question. Yulgok is often portrayed as a proponent of a qi-monism wherein Yulgok defends the primacy of process sensibilities in daoxue by augmenting the role of vital force at the expense of principle. While Yulgok does indeed have all kinds of illuminating insights into the role of vital force, he never abandons a deep concern for the role of principle. Yulgok forthrightly links the notion of principle creatively with the equally important concept of cheng or the self-actualization of the mind-heart. In making this strong linkage, Yulgok is able to defend the thesis that principle itself is a vital manifestation of the living creativity of the Dao as the ceaseless generation of the myriad things. It was a philosophical tour-de-force and is probably the most imaginative reinterpretation of Zhu’s daoxue to be found in traditional East Asia.

b. Kaibara Ekken

In 17th century Tokugawa Japan Kaibara Ekken (1630-1714) provides an exemplar of the Japanese contribution to the refinement of Neo-Confucian discourse. Ekken, like so many other great Confucian scholars, was something of a renaissance figure. This social concern manifested itself in some very traditional ventures such as the publication of his famous Precepts for Daily Life in Japan, wherein he tried to give advice about how Confucian principles could be applied to the conduct of concrete daily life. Moreover, this passion for the concrete details of daily life also led to a fervent naturalist concern for the world of plants, animals, fish and even shellfish. Ekken not only wrote about these humble creatures but, like many early Western naturalists, provided illustrations of these plants and animals.

Ekken’s concern for the dynamic processes of the quotidian world also led him to reread Zhu Xi’s daoxue in a dramatic way. For instance, Ekken argued that the Supreme Ultimate/Polarity was not some kind of abstract pattern but actually the correct name for the primordial qi before it began to divide into the yin and yang forces. Ekken did not abandon Zhu’s category of principle but rather read the cosmos via a stronger emphasis on the dynamic role of vital force. “The ‘Way of the sage’ is the principle of life and growth of heaven and earth; the original qi harmonizing the yin and yang in ceaseless fecundity” (Tucker 1989: 81). Ekken made a further deduction from his re-evaluation of the role of vital force, namely that there is no ontological or cosmological ground for holding to a distinction between the ideal nature, mandated by tian, and the physical nature or endowment of the particular creature or person. It is for this reason that Ekken is often held to be a champion of the primacy of a qi-monism, but this kind of reduction does not do justice to Ekken’s subtle re-inscription of the various roles of concepts such as principle, vital force and the Supreme Ultimate/Polarity within daoxue. Just as with his Korean colleagues, Ekken’s naturalistic vision of the Confucian Dao was such that he believed the nature of the Dao “flows through the seasons and never stops. It is the root of all transformations and it is the place from which all things emerge; it is the origin of all that is received from heaven” (Tucker 1989: 81).

The fate of Korean and Japanese Neo-Confucianism was subject to the same immense impact of the arrival of the Western imperial powers. As Korea and Japan struggled to find their ways in the modern world, Neo-Confucianism seemed a historical part of their traditional cultures and hardly something of great value for the transformations of culture in the contemporary world dominated by the Western powers. In this sense, the arrival of Western-inspired modernization marked the end of the Neo-Confucian epoch in East Asia.

7. The Legacy of Neo-Confucianism

The arrival of the imperial Western powers in East Asia during the nineteenth century caused an unprecedented challenge to the Confucian traditions of the region. Never before had the countries of East Asia faced a combination of military conquest, cultural attack and infiltration by a powerful new civilization. Opium, guns and ideas were pouring into Asia during the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, with catastrophic results for the sphere of Confucian East Asia. The intellectual assault was as powerful – and perhaps even more significant in the long term – as the material impositions of colonial and semi-colonial regimes. No Asian tradition suffered more than the Confucian Way.

Yet even in the darkest hours after 1911, a significant renewal movement arose in East Asia in defense of the good to be recovered from traditions such as Confucianism. Along with the revivals of Daoism and Buddhism, there was a new movement in East Asia called in English ‘New Confucianism’ in order to distinguish it from the previous avatars of the Confucian Way. Although New Confucianism has its obvious roots in the great achievements of the Song, Yuan, Ming and Qing periods, it is also the child of intercultural dialogue with Western philosophical movements and ideas. While it is too soon to chart the course of New Confucianism, it is clear that some form of the Confucian Way will not only survive into the 21st century but will flourish anew in East Asia and farther abroad wherever the East Asian Diaspora carries people for whom the Confucian Way functions as part of their cultural background.

Hitherto, it is impossible to chart the changes wrought by either contemporary philosophers who are dedicated to the revival and reformation of the Confucian Way or by other scholars who are interested in Confucian discourse as merely one important traditional element for modern East Asian philosophers to utilize in terms of their own constructive work. It is clear, however, that Neo-Confucianism has now passed over into a completely new era, that of New Confucian ecumenical dialogue and conversation with philosophers from around the global city of a vastly expanded new republic of letters.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Barrett, T. H. Li Ao: Buddhist, Taoist, or Neo-Confucian? Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Berthrong, John H. Transformations of the Confucian Way. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1998.
  • Berthrong, John H. and Berthrong, Evelyn Nagai. Confucianism: A Short Introduction. Oxford: Oneworld Publications, 2000.
  • Black, Alison Harley. Man and Nature in the Philosophical Thought of Wang Fu-chih. Seattle: University of Washington Press, 1989.
  • Bol, Peter K. "This Culture of Ours": Intellectual Transition in T'ang and Sung China. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1992.
  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei, Taiwan: The Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought. 2 Vols. New York: Bookman Associates, 1957-1962.
  • Chen, Chun. Neo-Confucian Terms Explained: The Pei-hsi tzu-I by Ch’en Ch’un (1159-1223). Trans. and ed. Wing-tsit Chan. New York: Columbia University Press, 1986.
  • Cheng, Chung-ying. New Dimensions of Confucian and Neo-Confucian Philosophy. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Cheng, Chung-ying and Nicholad Bunnin, eds. Contemporary Chinese Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2002.
  • Ching, Julia. To Acquire Wisdom: The Way of Wang Yang-ming. New York: Columbia University Press, 1976.
  • Ching, Julia. The Religious Thought of Chu Hsi. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Chu, Hsi and Lü Tsu-ch'ien. Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology. Trans. Wing-tsit Chan. New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
  • Chung, Edward Y. J. The Korean Neo-Confucianism of Yi T'oegye and Yi Yulgok: A Reappraisal of the "Four-Seven Thesis" and Its Practical Implications for Self-Cultivation. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1995.
  • Elman, Benjamin A. From Philosophy to Philosophy: Intellectual and Social Aspects of Change in Late Imperial China. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1984.
  • Fung, Yu-lan. A History of Chinese Philosophy. 2 vols. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1952-53.
  • Graham, A. C. Two Chinese Philosophers: The Metaphysics of the Brothers Ch'eng. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1992.
  • Hartman, Charles. Han Yü and the T'ang Search for Unity. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1986.
  • Henderson, John B. The Development and Decline of Chinese Cosmology. New York: Columbia University Press, 1984.
  • Huang- Siu-chi. Lu Hsiang-shan: A Twelfth Century Chinese Idealist Philosophy. Westport, CT: Hyperion Press, 1977.
  • Huang Tsung-hsi. The Records of Ming Scholars. Eds. Julia Ching with Chaoying Fang. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1987.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. Confucian Moral Self Cultivation. Second Edition. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2000.
  • Jensen, Lionel M. Manufacturing Confucianism: Chinese Traditions and Universal Civilization. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 1997.
  • Kalton, Michael C., et al. The Four Seven Debate: An Annotated Translation of the Most Famous Controversy in Korean Neo-Confucian Thought. Albany, N.Y.: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Kasoff, Ira E. The Thought of Chang Tsai. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Kim, Yung Sik. The Natural Philosophy of Chu Hsi, 1130-1200. Philadelphia, PA: Memoirs of the American Philosophic Society, 2000.
  • Ko, Dorothy. Teachers of the Inner Chambers: Women and Culture in Seventeenth-Century China. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1994.
  • Liu, James T. C. Reform in Sung China: Wang An-shih (1021-1086) and His New Policies. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1959.
  • Liu, James T. C. Ou-yang Hsiu: An Eleventh-Century Neo-Confucianist. Palo Alto, CA: Stanford University Press, 1967.
  • Liu, Shu-hsien. Understanding Confucian Philosophy: Classical and Sung-Ming. Westport, CT: Praeger, 1998.
  • Liu, Shu-hsien. Essentials of Contemporary Neo-Confucian Philosophy. Westport, CT and London: Praeger, 2003.
  • Makeham, John, ed. New Confucianism: A Critical Examination. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003.
  • Maruyama, Masao. Studies in the Intellectual History of Tokugawa Japan. Trans. Mikiso Hane. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1974.
  • Metzger, Thomas A. Escape from Predicament: Neo-Confucianism and China's Evolving Political Culture. New York: Columbia University Press, 1977.
  • Munro, Donald J. Images of Human Nature: A Sung Portrait. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
  • Neville, Robert C. Boston Confucianism: Portable Tradition in the Late-Modern World. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Nosco, Peter, ed. Confucianism and Tokugawa Culture. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Ro, Young-chan. The Korean Neo-Confucianism of Yi Yulgok. Albany, N.Y.: State University of New York Press, 1989.
  • Tillman, Hoyt Cleveland. Ch'en Liang on Public Interest and the Law. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1994.
  • Tillman, Hoyt Cleveland. Confucian Discourse and Chu Hsi's Ascendancy. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1992.
  • T’oegye, Yi. To Become a Sage: The Ten Diagrams on Sage Learning by Yi T'oegye. Trans. Michael C. Kalton. New York: Columbia University Press, 1988.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Neo-Confucian Thought in Action: Wang Yang-ming's Youth (1472-1509). Berkeley: University of California Press, 1976.
  • Tu, Wei-ming and Mary Evelyn Tucker, eds. Confucian Spirituality. 2 vols. New York: The Crossroad Publishing Company, 2003-04.
  • Tucker, Mary Evelyn. Moral and Spiritual Cultivation in Japanese Neo-Confucianism: The Life and Thought of Kaibara Ekken (1630-1714). Albany, N.Y.: State University of New York Press, 1989.
  • Yao, Xinzhong, ed. Encyclopedia of Confucianism. 2 vols. London and New York: RoutledgeCurzon, 2003.

Author Information

John H. Berthrong
Boston University
U. S. A.

Confucius (551—479 B.C.E.)

confuciusBetter known in China as "Master Kong" (Chinese: Kongzi), Confucius was a fifth-century BCE Chinese thinker whose influence upon East Asian intellectual and social history is immeasurable. As a culturally symbolic figure, he has been alternately idealized, deified, dismissed, vilified, and rehabilitated over the millennia by both Asian and non-Asian thinkers and regimes. Given his extraordinary impact on Chinese, Korean, Japanese, and Vietnamese thought, it is ironic that so little can be known about Confucius. The tradition that bears his name - "Confucianism" (Chinese: Rujia) - ultimately traces itself to the sayings and biographical fragments recorded in the text known as the Analects (Chinese: Lunyu). As with the person of Confucius himself, scholars disagree about the origins and character of the Analects, but it remains the traditional source for information about Confucius' life and teaching. Most scholars remain confident that it is possible to extract from the Analects several philosophical themes and views that may be safely attributed to this ancient Chinese sage. These are primarily ethical, rather than analytical-logical or metaphysical in nature, and include Confucius' claim that Tian ("Heaven") is aligned with moral order but dependent upon human agents to actualize its will; his concern for li (ritual propriety) as the instrument through which the family, the state, and the world may be aligned with Tian's moral order; and his belief in the "contagious" nature of moral force (de), by which moral rulers diffuse morality to their subjects, moral parents raise moral children, and so forth.

Table of Contents

  1. The Confucius of History
  2. The Confucius of the Analects
  3. Theodicy
  4. Harmonious order
  5. Moral force
  6. Self-cultivation
  7. The Confucius of Myth
  8. The Confucius of the State
  9. Key Interpreters of Confucius
  10. References and Further Reading

1. The Confucius of History

Sources for the historical recovery of Confucius' life and thought are limited to texts that postdate his traditional lifetime (551-479 BCE) by a few decades at least and several centuries at most. Confucius' appearances in Chinese texts are a sign of his popularity and utility among literate elites during the Warring States (403-221 BCE), Qin (221-206 BCE), and Han (206 BCE-220 CE) periods. These texts vary in character and function, from collections of biographical and pedagogical fragments such as the Analects to dynastic histories and works by later Confucian thinkers.

The historical Confucius, born in the small state of Lu on the Shandong peninsula in northeastern China, was a product of the "Spring and Autumn Period" (770-481 BCE). We know him mostly from texts that date to the "Warring States Period" (403-221 BCE). During these eras, China enjoyed no political unity and suffered from the internecine warfare of small states, remnants of the once-great Zhou polity that collapsed after "barbarian" invasions in 771 BCE. For more than three hundred years after the alleged year of Confucius' birth, the Chinese would fight each other for mastery of the empire lost by the Zhou. In the process, life became difficult, especially for the shi ("retainer" or “knight”) class, from which Confucius himself arose. As feudal lords were defeated and disenfranchised in battle and the kings of the various warring states began to rely on appointed administrators rather than vassals to govern their territories, these shi became lordless anachronisms and fell into genteel poverty and itinerancy. Their knowledge of aristocratic traditions, however, helped them remain valuable to competing kings, who wished to learn how to regain the unity imposed by the Zhou and who sought to emulate the Zhou by patterning court rituals and other institutions after those of the fallen dynasty.

Thus, a new role for shi as itinerant antiquarians emerged. In such roles, shi found themselves in and out of office as the fortunes of various patron states ebbed and flowed. Confucius is said to have held office for only a short time before withdrawing into scholarly retirement. While out of office, veteran shi might gather small circles of disciples - young men from shi backgrounds who wished to succeed in public life. It is precisely such master-and-disciple exchanges between Confucius and his students that the Analects claims to record.

2. The Confucius of the Analects

Above all else, the Analects depicts Confucius as someone who "transmits, but does not innovate" (7.1). What Confucius claimed to transmit was the Dao (Way) of the sages of Zhou antiquity; in the Analects, he is the erudite guardian of tradition who challenges his disciples to emulate the sages of the past and restore the moral integrity of the state. Although readers of the Analects often assume that Confucius' views are presented as a coherent and consistent system within the text, a careful reading reveals several different sets of philosophical concerns which do not conflict so much as they complement one another. These complimentary sets of concerns can be categorized into four groups:

  • Theodicy
  • Harmonious order
  • Moral force
  • Self-cultivation

3. Theodicy

Those familiar with Enlightenment-influenced presentations of Confucius as an austere humanist who did not discuss the supernatural may be surprised to encounter the term "theodicy" as a framework for understanding Confucius' philosophical concerns. Confucius’ record of silence on the subject of the divine is attested by the Analects (5.3, 7.21, 11.12). In fact, as a child of the late Zhou world, Confucius inherited a great many religious sensibilities, including theistic ones. For the early Chinese (c. 16th century BCE), the world was controlled by an all-powerful deity, "The Lord on High" (Shangdi), to whom entreaties were made in the first known Chinese texts, inscriptions found on animal bones offered in divinatory sacrifice. As the Zhou polity emerged and triumphed over the previous Shang tribal rule, Zhou apologists began to regard their deity, Tian ("Sky" or “Heaven”) as synonymous with Shangdi, the deity of the deposed Shang kings, and explained the decline of Shang and the rise of Zhou as a consequence of a change in Tianming ("the mandate of Heaven"). Thus, theistic justifications for conquest and rulership were present very early in Chinese history.By the time of Confucius, the concept of Tian appears to have changed slightly. For one thing, the ritual complex of Zhou diviners, which served to ascertain the will of Tian for the benefit of the king, had collapsed with Zhou rule itself. At the same time, the network of religious obligations to manifold divinities, local spirits, and ancestors does not seem to have ceased with the fall of the Zhou, and Confucius appears to uphold sacrifices to "gods and ghosts" as consistent with “transmitting” noble tradition. Yet, in the Analects, a new aspect of Tian emerges. For the Confucius of the Analects, discerning the will of Tian and reconciling it with his own moral compass sometimes proves to be a troubling exercise:

If Heaven is about to abandon this culture, those who die afterwards will not get to share in it; if Heaven has not yet abandoned this culture, what can the men of Guang [Confucius' adversaries in this instance] do to me? (9.5)

There is no one who recognizes me…. I neither resent Heaven nor blame humanity. In learning about the lower I have understood the higher. The one who recognizes me - wouldn't that be Heaven? (14.35)

Heaven has abandoned me! Heaven has abandoned me! (11.9)

As A. C. Graham has noted, Confucius seems to be of two minds about Tian. At times, he is convinced that he enjoys the personal protection and sanction of Tian, and thus defies his mortal opponents as he wages his campaign of moral instruction and reform. At other moments, however, he seems caught in the throes of existential despair, wondering if he has lost his divine backer at last. Tian seems to participate in functions of "fate" and “nature” as well as those of “deity.” What remains consistent throughout Confucius' discourses on Tian is his threefold assumption about this extrahuman, absolute power in the universe: (1) its alignment with moral goodness, (2) its dependence on human agents to actualize its will, and (3) the variable, unpredictable nature of its associations with mortal actors. Thus, to the extent that the Confucius of the Analects is concerned with justifying the ways of Tian to humanity, he tends to do so without questioning these three assumptions about the nature of Tian, which are rooted deeply in the Chinese past.

4. Harmonious order

The dependence of Tian upon human agents to put its will into practice helps account for Confucius' insistence on moral, political, social, and even religious activism. In one passage (17.19), Confucius seems to believe that, just as Tian does not speak but yet accomplishes its will for the cosmos, so too can he remain "silent" (in the sense of being out of office, perhaps) and yet effective in promoting his principles, possibly through the many disciples he trained for government service. At any rate, much of Confucius' teaching is directed toward the maintenance of three interlocking kinds of order: (1) aesthetic, (2) moral, and (3) social. The instrument for effecting and emulating all three is li (ritual propriety).

Do not look at, do not listen to, do not speak of, do not do whatever is contrary to ritual propriety. (12.1)

In this passage, Confucius underscores the crucial importance of rigorous attention to li as a kind of self-replicating blueprint for good manners and taste, morality, and social order. In his view, the appropriate use of a quotation from the Classic of Poetry (Shijing), the perfect execution of guest-host etiquette, and the correct performance of court ritual all serve a common end: they regulate and maintain order. The nature of this order is, as mentioned above, threefold. It is aesthetic -- quoting the Shijing upholds the cultural hegemony of Zhou literature and the conventions of elite good taste. Moreover, it is moral -- good manners demonstrate both concern for others and a sense of one's place. Finally, it is social -- rituals properly performed duplicate ideal hierarchies of power, whether between ruler and subject, parent and child, or husband and wife. For Confucius, the paramount example of harmonious social order seems to be xiao (filial piety), of which jing (reverence) is the key quality:

Observe what a person has in mind to do when his father is alive, and then observe what he does when his father is dead. If, for three years, he makes no changes to his father's ways, he can be said to be a good son. (1.11)

[The disciple] Ziyu asked about filial piety. The Master said, "Nowadays, for a person to be filial means no more than that he is able to provide his parents with food. Even dogs and horses are provided with food. If a person shows no reverence, where is the difference?" (2.7)

In serving your father and mother, you ought to dissuade them from doing wrong in the gentlest way. If you see your advice being ignored, you should not become disobedient but should remain reverent. You should not complain even if you are distressed. (4.18)

The character of this threefold order is deeper than mere conventions such as taste and decorum, as the above quotations demonstrate. Labeling it "aesthetic" might appear to demean or trivialize it, but to draw this conclusion is to fail to reflect on the peculiar way in which many Western thinkers tend to devalue the aesthetic. As David Hall and Roger Ames have argued, this "aesthetic" Confucian order is understood to be both intrinsically moral and profoundly harmonious, whether for a shi household, the court of a Warring States king, or the cosmos at large. When persons and things are in their proper places - and here tradition is the measure of propriety – relations are smooth, operations are effortless, and the good is sought and done voluntarily. In the hierarchical political and social conception of Confucius (and all of his Chinese contemporaries), what is below takes its cues from what is above. A moral ruler will diffuse morality to those under his sway; a moral parent will raise a moral child:

Let the ruler be a ruler, the subject a subject, a father a father, and a son a son. (12.11)

Direct the people with moral force and regulate them with ritual, and they will possess shame, and moreover, they will be righteous. (2.3)

5. Moral force

The last quotation from the Analects introduces a term perhaps most famously associated with a very different early Chinese text, the Laozi (Lao-tzu) or Daodejing (Tao Te Ching) - de (te), "moral force." Like Tian, de is heavily freighted with a long train of cultural and religious baggage, extending far back into the mists of early Chinese history. During the early Zhou period, de seems to have been a kind of amoral, almost magical power attributed to various persons - seductive women, charismatic leaders, etc. For Confucius, de seems to be just as magically efficacious, but stringently moral. It is both a quality, and a virtue of, the successful ruler:

One who rules by moral force may be compared to the North Star - it occupies its place and all the stars pay homage to it. (2.1)

De is a quality of the successful ruler, because he rules at the pleasure of Tian, which for Confucius is resolutely allied with morality, and to which he attributes his own inner de (7.23). De is the virtue of the successful ruler, without which he could not rule at all.

Confucius' vision of order unites aesthetic concerns for harmony and symmetry (li) with moral force (de) in pursuit of social goals: a well-ordered family, a well-ordered state, and a well-ordered world. Such an aesthetic, moral, and social program begins at home, with the cultivation of the individual.

6. Self-Cultivation

In the Analects, two types of persons are opposed to one another - not in terms of basic potential (for, in 17.2, Confucius says all human beings are alike at birth), but in terms of developed potential. These are the junzi (literally, "lord's son" or “gentleman”; Tu Wei-ming has originated the useful translation "profound person," which will be used here) and the xiaoren ("small person"):

The profound person understands what is moral. The small person understands what is profitable. (4.16)

The junzi is the person who always manifests the quality of ren (jen) in his person and the displays the quality of yi (i) in his actions (4.5). The character for ren is composed of two graphic elements, one representing a human being and the other representing the number two. Based on this, one often hears that ren means "how two people should treat one another." While such folk etymologies are common in discussions of Chinese characters, they often are as misleading as they are entertaining. In the case of ren - usually translated as "benevolence" or "humaneness" - the graphic elements of a human being and the number two really are instructive, so much so that Peter Boodberg suggested an evocative translation of ren as "co-humanity." The way in which the junzi relates to his fellow human beings, however, highlights Confucius' fundamentally hierarchical model of relations:

The moral force of the profound person is like the wind; the moral force of the small person is like the grass. Let the wind blow over the grass and it is sure to bend. (12.19)

D. C. Lau has pointed out that ren is an attribute of agents, while yi (literally, "what is fitting" -- “rightness,” "righteousness") is an attribute of actions. This helps to make clear the conceptual links between li, de, and the junzi. The junzi qua junzi exerts de, moral force, according to what is yi, fitting (that is, what is aesthetically, morally, and socially proper), and thus manifests ren, or the virtue of co-humanity in an interdependent, hierarchical universe over which Tian presides.

Two passages from the Analects go a long way in indicating the path toward self-cultivation that Confucius taught would-be junzi in fifth century BCE China:

From the age of fifteen on, I have been intent upon learning; from thirty on, I have established myself; from forty on, I have not been confused; from fifty on, I have known the mandate of Heaven; from sixty on, my ear has been attuned; from seventy on, I have followed my heart's desire without transgressing what is right. (2.4)

The Master's Way is nothing but other-regard and self-reflection. (4.15)

The first passage illustrates the gradual and long-term scale of the process of self-cultivation. It begins during one's teenaged years, and extends well into old age; it proceeds incrementally from intention (zhi) to learning (xue), from knowing the mandate of Heaven (Tianming) to doing both what is desired (yu) and what is right (yi). In his disciple Zengzi (Tseng-tzu)'s summary of his "Way" (Dao), Confucius teaches only "other-regard" (zhong) and “self-reflection” (shu). These terms merit their own discussion.

The conventional meaning of "other-regard" (zhong) in classical Chinese is "loyalty," especially loyalty to a ruler on the part of a minister. In the Analects, Confucius extends the meaning of the term to include exercising oneself to the fullest in all relationships, including relationships with those below oneself as well as with one's betters. "Self-reflection" (shu) is explained by Confucius as a negatively-phrased version of the "Golden Rule": “What you do not desire for yourself, do not do to others.” (15.24) When one reflects upon oneself, one realizes the necessity of concern for others. The self as conceptualized by Confucius is a deeply relational self that responds to inner reflection with outer virtue.

Similarly, the self that Confucius wishes to cultivate in his own person and in his disciples is one that looks within and compares itself with the aesthetic, moral, and social canons of tradition. Aware of its source in Tian, it seeks to maximize ren through apprenticeship to li so as to exercise de in a manner befitting a junzi. Because Confucius (and early Chinese thought in general) does not suffer from the Cartesian "mind-body problem" (as Herbert Fingarette has demonstrated), there is no dichotomy between inner and outer, self and whole, and thus the cumulative effect of Confucian self-cultivation is not merely personal, but collectively social and even cosmic.

7. The Confucius of Myth

While the Analects is valuable, albeit not infallible, as a source for the reconstruction of Confucius' thought, it is far from being the only text to which Chinese readers have turned in their quest for discovering his identity. During the Han dynasty (206 BCE-220 CE), numerous hagiographical accounts of Confucius' origins and deeds were produced, many of which would startle readers familiar only with the Analects. According to various texts, Confucius was a superhuman figure destined to rule as the "uncrowned king" of pre-imperial China. At birth, his body was said to have displayed special markings indicating his exemplary status. After his death, he was alleged to have revealed himself in a glorified state to his living disciples, who then received further esoteric teachings from their apotheosized master. Eventually, and perhaps inevitably, he was recognized as a deity and a cult organized itself around his worship. Feng Youlan has suggested that, had these Han images of Confucius prevailed, Confucius would have become a figure comparable to Jesus Christ in the history of China, and there would have been no arguments among scholars about whether or not Confucianism was a religion like Christianity.

To both ancient modern eyes, fantastic and improbable myths of Confucius should be added more recent myths about the sage that date from the earliest sustained contact between China and the West during the early modern period. The Latinization of Kong(fu)zi to "Confucius" originates with the interpretation of Chinese culture and thought by Jesuit missionaries for their Western audiences, supporters, and critics. Jesuits steeped in Renaissance humanism saw in Confucius a Renaissance humanist; German thinkers such as Leibniz or Wolff recognized in him an Enlightenment sage. Hegel condemned Confucius for exemplifying those whom he saw as "the people without history"; Mao castigated Confucius for imprisoning China in a cage of feudal archaism and oppression. Each remade Confucius in his own image for his own ends - a process that continues throughout the modern era, creating great heat and little light where the historical Confucius himself is concerned. Each mythologizer has seen Confucius as a symbol of whatever s/he loves or hates about China. As H. G. Creel once put it, once a figure like Confucius has become a cultural hero, stories about him tell us more about the values of the storytellers than about Confucius himself.

8. The Confucius of the State

Such mythmaking was very important to the emerging imperial Chinese state, however, as it struggled to impose cultural unity on a vast and fractious territory during the final few centuries BCE and beyond into the Common Era. After the initial persecution of Confucians during the short-lived Qin dynasty (221-202 BCE), the succeeding Han emperors and their ministers seized upon Confucius as a vehicle for the legitimation of their rule and the social control of their subjects. The "Five Classics" - five ancient texts associated with Confucius - were established as the basis for the imperial civil service examinations in 136 BCE, making memorization of these texts and their orthodox Confucian interpretations mandatory for all who wished to obtain official positions in the Han government. The state's love affair with Confucius carried on through the end of the Han in 220 CE, after which Confucius fell out of official favor as a series of warring factions struggled for control of China during the "Period of Disunity" (220-589 CE) and foreign and indigenous religious traditions such as Buddhism and Daoism rivaled Confucianism for the attentions of the elite.

After the restoration of unified imperial government with the Tang dynasty (618-907 CE), however, the future of Confucius as a symbol of the Chinese cultural and political establishment became increasingly secure. State-sponsored sacrifices to him formed part of the official religious complex of temple rituals, from the national to the local level, and orthodox hagiography and history cemented his reputation as cultural hero among the masses. The Song dynasty (969-1279 CE) Confucian scholar Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) institutionalized the study of the Analects as one of "Four Books" required for the redesigned imperial civil service examinations, and aspiring officials continued to memorize the text and orthodox commentaries on it until the early twentieth century.

With the fall of the last Chinese imperial government in 1911, Confucius also fell from his position of state-imposed grandeur - but not for long. Within a short time of the abdication of the last emperor, monarchists were plotting to restore a Confucian ruler to the throne. Although these plans did not materialize, the Nationalist regime in mainland China and later in Taiwan has promoted Confucius and Confucianism in a variety of ways in order to distinguish itself from the iconoclastic Communists who followed Mao to victory and control over most of China in 1949. Even the Communist regime in China has bowed reverentially to Confucius on occasion, although not without vilifying him first, especially during the anti-traditional "Cultural Revolution" campaigns of the late 1960s and early 1970s.

Today, the Communist government of China spends a great deal of money on the reconstruction and restoration of old imperial temples to Confucius across the country, and has even erected many new statues of Confucius in areas likely to be frequented by tourists from overseas. Predictably, Confucius, as a philosopher, has been rehabilitated by culturally Chinese regimes across Asia, from Singapore to Beijing, as what Wm. Th. de Bary has called "the East Asian challenge for human rights" has prompted attempts to ground "human rights with Chinese characteristics" in an authentically traditional source. In short, Confucius seems far from dead, although one wonders if the authentic spirit of his fifth century BCE thought ever will live again.

9. Key Interpreters of Confucius

Detailed discussion of Confucius' key interpreters is best reserved for an article on Confucian philosophy. Nonetheless, an outline of the most important commentators and their philosophical trajectories is worth including here.

The two best known early interpreters of Confucius' thought - besides the compilers of the Analects themselves, who worked gradually from the time of Confucius' death until sometime during the former Han dynasty - are the Warring States philosophers "Mencius" or Mengzi (Meng-tzu, 372-289 BCE) and Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE). Neither knew Confucius personally, nor did they know one another, except retrospectively, as in the case of Xunzi commenting on Mencius. The two usually are cast as being opposed to one another because of their disagreement over human nature - a subject on which Confucius was notably silent (Analects 5.13).

Mencius illustrates a pattern typical of Confucius' interpreters in that he claims to be doing nothing more than "transmitting" Confucius' thought while introducing new ideas of his own. For Mencius, renxing (human nature) is congenitally disposed toward ren, but requires cultivation through li as well as yogic disciplines related to one's qi (vital energy), and may be stunted (although never destroyed) through neglect or negative environmental influence. Confucius does not use the term renxing in the Analects, nor does he describe qi in Mencius' sense, and nowhere does he provide an account of the basic goodness of human beings. Nonetheless, it is Mencius' interpretation of Confucius’ thought - especially after the ascendancy of Zhu Xi's brand of Confucianism in the twelfth century CE - that became regarded as orthodox by most Chinese thinkers.

Like Mencius, Xunzi claims to interpret Confucius' thought authentically, but leavens it with his own contributions. Whereas Mencius claims that human beings are originally good but argues for the necessity of self-cultivation, Xunzi claims that human beings are originally bad but argues that they can be reformed, even perfected, through self-cultivation. Also like Mencius, Xunzi sees li as the key to the cultivation of renxing. Although Xunzi condemns Mencius' arguments in no uncertain terms, when one has risen above the smoke and din of the fray, one may see that the two thinkers share many assumptions, including one that links each to Confucius: the assumption that human beings can be transformed by participation in traditional aesthetic, moral, and social disciplines.

Later interpreters of Confucius' thought between the Tang and Ming dynasties are often grouped together under the label of "Neo-Confucianism." This term has no cognate in classical Chinese, but is useful insofar as it unites several thinkers from disparate eras who share common themes and concerns. Thinkers such as Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-1077 CE), Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE), and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE), while distinct from one another, agree on the primacy of Confucius as the fountainhead of the Confucian tradition, share Mencius' understanding of human beings as innately good, and revere the "Five Classics" and “Four Books” associated with Confucius as authoritative sources for standards of ritual, moral, and social propriety. These thinkers also display a bent toward the cosmological and metaphysical which isolates them from the Confucius of the Analects, and betrays the influence of Buddhism and Daoism - two movements with little or no popular following in Confucius' China -- on their thought.

This cursory review of some seminal interpreters of Confucius' thought illustrates a principle that ought to be followed by all who seek to understanding Confucius' philosophical views: suspicion of the sources. All sources for reconstructing Confucius' views, from the Analects on down, postdate the master and come from a hand other than his own, and thus all should be used with caution and with an eye toward possible influences from outside of fifth century BCE China.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Allan, Sarah. The Way of Water and Sprouts of Virtue. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Allinson, Robert E. "The Golden Rule as the Core Value in Confucianism and Christianity: Ethical Similarities and Differences." Asian Philosophy 2/2 (1992): 173-185.
  • Ames, Roger T., and Henry Rosemont, Jr., trans. The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation. New York: Ballatine, 1998.
  • Ames, Roger T. "The Focus-Field Self in Classical Confucianism," in Self as Person in Asian Theory and Practice, ed. Roger T. Ames (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994), 187-212.
  • Berthrong, John. "Trends in the Interpretation of Confucian Religiosity," in The Confucian-Christian Encounter in Historical and Contemporary Perspective, ed. Peter K. H. Lee (Lewiston, ME: Edwin Mellen Press, 1991), 226-254.
  • Boodberg, Peter A. "The Semasiology of Some Primary Confucian Concepts," in Selected Works of Peter A. Boodberg, ed. Alvin P. Cohen (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1979), 26-40.
  • Brooks, E. Bruce and A. Taeko, trans. The Original Analects: Sayings of Confucius and His Successors. New York: Columbia University Press, 1998.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Cheng, Anne. "Lun-yü," in Early Chinese Texts: A Bibliographical Guide, ed. Michael Loewe (Berkeley: Society for the Study of Early China and the Institute of East Asian Studies, University of California, Berkeley, 1993), 313-323.
  • Creel, Herrlee G. Confucius and the Chinese Way. New York: Harper and Row, 1949.
  • Creel, Herrlee G. "Was Confucius Agnostic?" T'oung Pao 29 (1935): 55-99.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mark. "Confucius and the Analects in the Hàn," in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 134-162.
  • Eno, Robert. The Confucian Creation of Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Fingarette, Herbert. Confucius -- The Secular as Sacred. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1972.
  • Graham, A. C. Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1989.
  • Hall, David L., and Roger T. Ames. Thinking Through Confucius. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. "Whose Confucius? Which Analects?" in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 119-133.
  • Lau, D.C., trans. Confucius -- The Analects. 2nd ed. Hong Kong: Chinese University Press, 1992.
  • Legge, James, trans. Confucius -- Confucian Analects, The Great Learning, and the Doctrine of the Mean. New York: Dover Publications, 1971.
  • Munro, Donald J. The Concept of Man In Early China. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1969.
  • Nivison, David S. "The Classical Philosophical Writings," in The Cambridge History of Ancient China: From the Origins of Civilization to 221 B.C., ed. Michael Loewe and Edward L. Shaughnessy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), 745-812.
  • Nivison, David S. The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Bryan W. Van Norden. Chicago and La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1996.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin I. The World of Thought in Ancient China. Cambridge, MA: The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • Shryock, John K. The Origin and Development of the State Cult of Confucius. New York: Century Company, 1932.
  • Taylor, Rodney L. "The Religious Character of the Confucian Tradition." Philosophy East and West 48/1 (January 1998): 80-107.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. "Li as a Process of Humanization," in Tu, Humanity and Self-Cultivation: Essays in Confucian Thought (Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press, 1979), 17-34.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W. "Introduction," in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 3-38.
  • Waley, Arthur, trans. The Analects of Confucius. New York: The MacMillan Company, 1938.

Author Information

Jeff Richey
Berea College
U. S. A.

Daoist Philosophy

daoismAlong with Confucianism, “Daoism” (sometimes called "Taoism") is one of the two great indigenous philosophical traditions of China. As an English term, Daoism corresponds to both Daojia (“Dao family” or “school of the Dao”), an early Han dynasty (c. 100s BCE) term which describes so-called “philosophical” texts and thinkers such as Laozi and Zhuangzi, and Daojiao (“teaching of the Dao”), which describes various so-called  “religious” movements dating from the late Han dynasty (c. 100s CE) onward.  Thus, “Daoism” encompasses thought and practice that sometimes are viewed as “philosophical,” as “religious,” or as a combination of both.  While modern scholars, especially those in the West, have been preoccupied with classifying Daoist material as either “philosophical” or “religious,” historically Daoists themselves have been uninterested in such categories and dichotomies.  Instead, they have preferred to focus on understanding the nature of reality, increasing their longevity, ordering life morally, practicing rulership, and regulating consciousness and diet.  Fundamental Daoist ideas and concerns include wuwei (“effortless action”), ziran (“naturalness”), how to become a shengren (“sage”) or zhenren (“realized person”), and the ineffable, mysterious Dao (“Way”) itself.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Daoism?
  2. Classical Sources for Our Understanding of Daoism
  3. Is Daoism a Philosophy or a Religion?
  4. The Daodejing
  5. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing
  6. The Zhuangzi
  7. Basic Concepts in the Zhuangzi
  8. Daoism and Confucianism
  9. Daoism in the Han
  10. Celestial Masters Daoism
  11. Neo-Daoism
  12. Shangqing and Lingbao Daoist Movements
  13. Tang Daoism
  14. The Three Teachings
  15. The "Destruction" of Daoism
  16. References and Further Reading

1. What is Daoism?

Strictly speaking there was no Daoism before the literati of the Han dynasty (c. 200 BCE) tried to organize the writings and ideas that represented the major intellectual alternatives available. The name daojia, "Dao family" or "school of the dao was a creation of the historian Sima Tan (d. 110 BCE) in his Shi ji (Records of the Historian) written in the 2nd century BCE and later completed by his son, Sima Qian (145-186 BCE). In his classification, the Daoists are listed as one of the Six Schools: Yin-Yang, Confucian, Mohist, Legalist, School of Names, and Daoists. So, Daoism was a retroactive grouping of ideas and writings which were already at least one to two centuries old, and which may or may not have been ancestral to various post-classical religious movements, all self-identified as daojiao ("teaching of the dao"), beginning with the reception of revelations from the deified Laozi by the Celestial Masters (Tianshi) lineage founder, Zhang Daoling, in 142 CE. This entry privileges the formative influence of early texts, such as the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, but accepts contemporary Daoists' assertion of continuity between classical and post-classical, "philosophical" and "religious" movements and texts.

2. Classical Sources for Our Understanding of Daoism

Daoism does not name a tradition constituted by a founding thinker, even though the common belief is that a teacher named Laozi founded the school and wrote its major work, called the Daodejing, also sometimes known as the Laozi. The tradition is also called "Lao-Zhuang" philosophy, referring to what are commonly regarded as its two classical and most influential texts: the Daodejing or Laozi (3rd Cent. BCE) and the Zhuangzi (4th-3rd Cent BCE). However, this stream of thought existed in an oral form, passed along by the masters who developed and transmitted it before it came to be written in these texts. There are two major source issues to be considered. 1) What evidence is there for Daoist beliefs and practices prior to the two classical texts? 2) What is the best reconstruction of the classical textual tradition upon which Daoism was based?

With regard to the first question, Isabelle Robinet thinks that the classical texts are only the most lasting evidence of a movement she associates with a set of writings called the Songs of Chu (Chuci), and that she identifies as the Chuci movement. This movement reflects a culture in which male and female masters called fangshi, daoshi, or daoren practiced techniques of longevity and used diet, meditation and generated wisdom teachings. While Robinet's interpretation is controversial, there are undeniable connections between the Songs of Chu and later Daoist ideas. Some examples include a coincidence of names of immortals (sages), a commitment to the pursuit of physical immortality, a belief in the epistemic value of stillness and quietude, abstinence from grains, breathing and sexual practices used to regulate internal energy (qi), and the use of dances that resemble those still done by Daoist masters (the step of Yu).

In addition to the controversial connection to the Songs of Chu, the Guanzi (350-250 BCE) is a text older than both the Daodejing and probably all of the Zhuangzi, except the "inner chapters" (see below). This is a very important work of 76 "chapters." Three of the chapters of the Guanzi are called the Neiye, which can mean "inner cultivation." The self-cultivation practices and teachings put forward in this material may be fruitfully linked to several other important works: the Daodejing; the Zhuangzi; a Han dynasty Daoist work called the Huainanzi; and an early commentary on the Daodejing called the Xiang'er. Indeed, there is a strong meditative trend in the Daoism of late imperial China known as the "inner alchemy" tradition and the views of the Neiye seem to be in the background of this movement. Two other chapters of the Guanzi are called Xin shu (Heart-mind book). The Xin shu connects the ideas of quietude and stillness found in the Daodejing to longevity practices. The idea of dao in these chapters is very much like that of the Daodejing. Its image of the sage resembles that of the Zhuangzi. It uses the same term (zheng) that Zhuangzi uses for the corrections a sage must make in his body, the pacification of the heart-mind, and the concentration and control of internal energy (qi). These practices are called "holding onto the One," "keeping the One," "obtaining the One," all of which are phrases associated with the Daodejing (chs. 10, 22, 39).

As for a reasonable reconstruction of the textual tradition upon which Daoism is based, we should not try to think of this task so simply as determining the relationship between the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi as though they were not composite. Zhuangzi repeats in very similar form sayings found in the Daodejing. However, we are not certain whether this means that Zhuangzi knew the Daodejing and quoted it, or if they both drew from a common source, or even if the Daodejing in some way depended on the Zhuangzi. In fact, one theory about the mythological figure Laozi is that he was created first in the Zhuangzi and later associated with the Daodejing.

We could offer the following summary of the sources of early Daoism. Stage One: Zhuang Zhou's "inner chapters" (chs. 1-7) of the Zhuangzi (c. 350 BCE) and some components of the Guanzi, including perhaps both the Neiye and the Xin shu. Stage Two: Some parts of the "mixed chapters" (chs. 23-33) of the Zhuangzi and the final redaction of the Daodejing. Stage Three: the Huang-Lao manuscripts from Mawangdui (see below); the "outer chapters" (8-22) of the Zhuangzi, and the Huainanzi (180-122 BCE).

3. Is Daoism a Philosophy or a Religion?

In the late 1970s Western and comparative philosophers began to point out that an important dimension of the historical context of Daoism was being overlooked because the previous generation of scholars had ignored or even disparaged connections between the classical texts and Daoist religious belief and practice. We have to lay some of the responsibility for such neglect at the feet of the eminent translator and philosopher Wing-Tsit Chan, who spoke of Daoist religion as a degeneration of Daoist philosophy arising from the time of the Celestial Masters (see below) in the late Han period. He was an instrumental architect of the view that Daoist philosophy (daojia) and Daoist religion (daojiao) are entirely different traditions.

Our interest in trying to separate philosophy and religion in Daoism is more revealing of the Western frame of reference we use than of Daoism itself. Daoist ideas fermented among master teachers who had a holistic view of life. These daoshi (Daoist masters) did not compartmentalize practices by which they sought to influence the forces of reality, increase their longevity, have interaction with realities not apparent to our normal way of seeing things, and order life morally and by rulership. They offered insights we might call philosophical aphorisms. But they also practiced meditation and physical exercises, studied nature for diet and remedy, practiced rituals related to their view that reality had many layers and forms with whom/which humans could interact, led small communities, and advised rulers on all these subjects. The masters transmitted their teachings, some of them only to disciples and adepts, but gradually these became more widely available as is evidenced in the very creation of the Daodejing and Zhuangzi themselves.

The agenda that provoked Westerners to separate philosophy and religion, dating at least to the classical Greek period of philosophy was not part of the preoccupation of Daoists. Accordingly, the question whether Daoism is a philosophy or a religion is not one we can ask without imposing a set of understandings, presuppositions, and qualifications that do not apply to Daoism. But this is not a reason to discount the importance of Daoist thought. Quite to the contrary, it may be one of the most significant ideas classical Daoism can contribute to the study of philosophy in the present age.

4. The Daodejing

The Daodejing (hereafter, DDJ) is divided into 81 "chapters" consisting of slightly over 5,000 Chinese characters, depending on which text is used. In its received form from Wang Bi (see below), the two major divisions of the text are the dao jing (chs. 1-37) and the de jing (chs. 38-81). Actually, this division probably rests on little else than the fact that the principal concept opening Chapter 1 is dao (way) and that of Chapter 38 is de (virtue). The text is a collection of short aphorisms that were not arranged to develop any systematic argument. The long standing tradition about the authorship of the text is that the "founder" of Daoism, known as Laozi gave it to Yin Xi, the guardian of the pass through the mountains that he used to go from China to the West. But the text is a composite of collected materials, most of which probably circulated orally perhaps even in single aphorisms or small collections. Insufficient study of the text has been done to formulate any consensus about whether the text was composed using smaller written collections.

For almost 2,000 years, the Chinese text used by commentators in China and upon which all except the most recent Western language translations were based has been called the Wang Bi, after the commentator who used a complete edition of the DDJ sometime between 226-249 CE. Although Wang Bi was not a Daoist, his commentary became a standard interpretive guide, and generally speaking even today scholars depart from it only when they can make a compelling argument for doing so. Based on recent archaeological finds at Guodian in 1993 and Mawangdui in the 1970s we are certain that there were several simultaneously circulating versions of the Daodejing text.

Mawangdui is the name for a site of tombs discovered near Changsha in Hunan province. The Mawangdui discoveries consist of two incomplete editions of the DDJ on silk scrolls (boshu) now simply called "A" and "B." These versions have two principal differences from the Wang Bi. Some word choice divergencies are present. The order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the Mawangdui versions. More precisely, the order of the Mawangdui texts takes the traditional 81 chapters and sets them out like this: 38, 39, 40, 42-66, 80, 81, 67-79, 1-21, 24, 22, 23, 25-37. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu, Te-tao Ching. Contemporary scholarship associates the Mawangdui versions with a type of Daoism known as the Way of the Yellow Emperor and the Old Master (Huanglao Dao), since the Yellow Emperor was venerated alongside of Laozi as a patron of the teachings of Daoism. The prevailing view is that the present version of the DDJ probably reached its final form at the Qixia Academy of the Ji kingdom associated with Huanglao Daoism around the beginning of the 3rd century BCE.

The Guodian find consists of 730 inscribed bamboo slips found near the village of Guodian in Hubei province in 1993. There are 71 slips with material that is also found in 31 of the 81 chapters of the DDJ and corresponding to Chapters 1-66. It may date as early as c. 300 BCE. If this is a correct date, then the Daodejing was already extant in a written form when the "inner chapters" (see below) of the Zhuangzi were composed. These slips contain more significant variants from the Wang Bi than the Mawangdui versions.

5. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing

The term Dao means a road, and is often translated as "the Way." This is because sometimes dao is used as a nominative (that is, "the dao") and other times as a verb (i.e. daoing). Dao is the process of reality itself, the way things come together, while still transforming. All this reflects the deep seated Chinese belief that change is the most basic character of things. In the Yi jing (Classic of Change) the patterns of this change are symbolized by figures standing for 64 relations of correlative forces and known as the hexagrams. Dao is the alteration of these forces, most often simply stated as yin and yang. The Xici is a commentary on the Yi jing formed in about the same period as the DDJ. It takes the taiji (Great Ultimate) as the source of correlative change and associates it with the dao. The contrast is not between what things are or that something is or is not, but between chaos (hundun) and the way reality is ordering (de). Yet, reality is not ordering into one unified whole. It is the 10,000 things (wanwu). There is the dao but not "the World" or "the cosmos" in a Western sense.

The Daodejing teaches that humans cannot fathom the Dao, because any name we give to it cannot capture it. It is beyond what we can conceive (ch.1). Those who wu wei may become one with it and thus "obtain the dao." Wu wei is a difficult notion to translate. Yet, it is generally agreed that the traditional rendering of it as "nonaction" or "no action" is incorrect. Those who wu wei do act. Daoism is not a philosophy of "doing nothing." Wu wei means something like "act naturally," "effortless action," or "nonwillful action." The point is that there is no need for human tampering with the flow of reality. Wu wei should be our way of life, because the dao always benefits, it does not harm (ch. 81) The way of heaven (dao of tian) is always on the side of good (ch. 79) and virtue (de) comes forth from the dao alone (ch. 21). What causes this natural embedding of good and benefit in the dao is vague and elusive (ch. 35), not even the sages understand it (ch. 76). But the world is a reality that is filled with spiritual force, just as a sacred image used in religious ritual might be (ch. 29). The dao occupies the place in reality that is analogous to the part of a family's house set aside for the altar for venerating the ancestors and gods (the ao of the house, ch. 62). When we think that life's occurrences seem unfair (a human discrimination), we should remember that heaven's (tian) net misses nothing, it leaves nothing undone (ch. 37)

A central theme of the Daodejing is that correlatives are the expressions of the movement of dao. Correlatives in Chinese philosophy are not opposites, mutually excluding each other. They represent the ebb and flow of the forces of reality: yin/yang, male/female; excess/defect; leading/following; active/passive. As one approaches the fullness of yin, yang begins to horizon and emerge. Its teachings on correlation often suggest to interpreters that the DDJ is filled with paradoxes. For example, ch. 22 says, "Those who are crooked will be perfected. Those who are bent will be straight. Those who are empty will be full." While these appear paradoxical, they are probably better understood as correlational in meaning. The DDJ says, "straightforward words seem paradoxical," implying, however, that they are not (ch. 78).

What is the image of the ideal person, the sage (sheng ren), the real person (zhen ren) in the DDJ? Well, sages wu wei, (chs. 2, 63). In this respect, they are like newborn infants, who move naturally, without planning and reliance on the structures given to them by others (ch. 15). The DDJ tells us that sages empty themselves, becoming void of pretense. Sages concentrate their internal energies (qi). They clean their vision (ch. 10). They manifest plainness and become like uncarved wood (pu) (ch. 19). They live naturally and free from desires given by men (ch. 37) They settle themselves and know how to be content (ch. 46). The DDJ makes use of some very famous analogies to drive home its point. Sages know the value of emptiness as illustrated by how emptiness is used in a bowl, door, window, valley or canyon (ch. 11). They preserve the female (yin), meaning that they know how to be receptive and are not unbalanced favoring assertion and action (yang) (ch. 28). They shoulder yin and embrace yang, blend internal energies (qi) and thereby attain harmony (he) (ch. 42). Those following the dao do not strive, tamper, or seek control (ch. 64). They do not endeavor to help life along (ch. 55), or use their heart-mind (xin) to "solve" or "figure out" life's apparent knots and entanglements (ch. 55). Indeed, the DDJ cautions that those who would try to do something with the world will fail, they will actually ruin it (ch. 29). Sages do not engage in disputes and arguing, or try to prove their point (chs. 22, 81). They are pliable and supple, not rigid and resistive (chs. 76, 78). They are like water (ch. 8), finding their own place, overcoming the hard and strong by suppleness (ch. 36). Sages act with no expectation of reward (chs. 2, 51). They put themselves last and yet come first (ch. 7). They never make a display of themselves, (chs. 72, 22). They do not brag or boast, (chs. 22, 24) and they do not linger after their work is done (ch. 77). They leave no trace (ch. 27). Because they embody dao in practice, they have longevity (ch. 16). They create peace (ch. 32). Creatures do not harm them (chs. 50, 55). Soldiers do not kill them (ch. 50). Heaven (tian) protects the sage and the sage becomes invincible (ch. 67).

Among the most controversial of the teachings in the DDJ are those directly associated with rulers. Recent scholarship is moving toward a consensus that the persons who developed and collected the teachings of the DDJ played some role in civil administration, but they may also have been practitioners of ritual arts and what we would call religious rites. Be that as it may, many of the aphorisms directed toward rulers seem puzzling at first sight. According to the DDJ, the proper ruler keeps the people without knowledge, (ch. 65), fills their bellies, opens their hearts and empties them of desires (ch. 3). A sagely ruler reduces the size of the state and keeps the population small. Even though the ruler possesses weapons, they are not used (ch. 80). The ruler does not seek prominence. The ruler is a shadowy presence (chs. 17, 66). When the ruler's work is done, the people say they are content (ch. 17). This is all the more interesting when we remember that the philosopher and legalist political theorist named Han Feizi used the DDJ as a guide for the unification of China. Han Feizi was the foremost counselor of the first emperor of China, Qin Shihuangdi (r. 221-206 BCE). It is a pity that the emperor used the DDJ's admonitions to "fill the bellies and empty the minds" to justify his program of destroying all books not related to medicine, astronomy or agriculture.

6. The Zhuangzi

The second of the two most important classical texts of Daoism is the Zhuangzi. This text is a collection of stories and imaginary conversations known for its creativity and skillful use of language. The text contains longer and shorter treatises, stories, poetry, and aphorisms. It dates to the late 4th century BCE and originally had 52 "chapters." These were reduced to 33 by Guo Xiang in the 3rd century CE. Unlike the Daodejing which is ascribed to the mythological Laozi, the Zhuangzi may actually contain materials from a teacher known as Zhuang Zhou who lived between 370-300 BCE, according to Sima Qian. Chapters 1-7 are those most often ascribed to Zhuangzi himself (which is a title meaning "Master Zhuang") and these are known as the "inner chapters." The remaining 26 chapters had other origins and they sometimes take different points of view from the inner chapters. They are divided into the "outer chapters" (chs. 8-22) and "mixed chapters," (chs. 23-33). The full text probably did not reach its completed form until about 130 BCE.

7. Basic Concepts in the Zhuangzi

Zhuangzi taught that a set of practices, including meditation, helped one achieve unity with the dao and become a "true person" (zhen ren). The way to this state is not the result of a withdrawal from life. However, it does require a disengagement from conventional values and the demarcations made by society. In Chapter 23 of the Zhuangzi, a character inquiring of Laozi about the solution to his life's worries was answered promptly: "Why did you come with all this crowd of people?" The man looked around and confirmed he was standing alone, but Laozi meant that his problems were the result of all the baggage of ideas and conventional opinions he lugged about with him. This baggage must be discarded before anyone can be zhen ren. As we see in this case, the Zhuangzi often employs apparently nonsensical remarks and questions, as well as humor to make its points.

Like the DDJ, Zhuangzi also valorizes wu wei. For his examples of such living Zhuangzi turns to analogies of craftsmen, athletes (swimmers), woodcarvers, and even butchers. One of the most famous stories in the text is that of Ding the Butcher, who learned what it means to wu wei through the perfection of his craft. When asked about his great skill, Ding says, "What I care about is dao, which goes beyond skill. When I first began cutting up oxen, all I could see was the ox itself. After three years I no longer saw the whole ox. And now—now I go at it by spirit and don't look with my eyes. Perception and understanding have come to a stop and spirit moves where it wants. I go along with the natural makeup, strike in the big hollows, guide the knife through the big openings, and follow things as they are. So I never touch the smallest ligament or tendon, much less a main joint. A good cook changes his knife once a year—because he cuts. A mediocre cook changes his knife once a month—because he hacks. I've had this knife of mine for nineteen years and I've cut up thousands of oxen with it, and yet the blade is as good as though it had just come from the grindstone. There are spaces between the joints, and the blade of the knife has really no thickness….[I] move the knife with the greatest subtlety, until—flop! The whole thing comes apart like a clod of earth crumbling to the ground." (Ch. 3, The Secret of Caring for Life)

Persons who exemplify such understanding are called sages, zhen ren, and immortals. Zhuangzi describes the Daoist sage in such a way as to suggest that he possesses extraordinary powers. This is the result of a way of living that cannot be dichotomized into philosophical and religious categories. Early Daoism makes no such demarcation. Being able to have union with the dao means to see from the viewpoint of the dao, and not by the limits of the conceptual and sensory apparatus that confines us (the way Ding moves his knife through the meat without looking).

Zhuangzi is drawing on a set of beliefs that were probably regarded as literal by many, although some think he meant these to be taken metaphorically. For example, when Zhuangzi says that the sage cannot be harmed or made to suffer by anything that life presents, does he mean this to be taken as saying that the zhen ren is physically invincible? Or, does he mean that the sage has so freed himself from all conventional understandings that he refuses to recognize poverty as any more or less desirable than affluence, to recognize blindness as worse than sight, to recognize death as any less desirable than life? As the Zhuangzi says in Chapter One, Free and Easy Wandering, "There is nothing that can harm this man." This is also the theme of Chapter Two, On Making All Things Equal. In this chapter people are urged to "make all things one," meaning that they should recognize that reality is one. It is human judgment that what happens is beautiful or ugly, right or wrong, fortunate or not. The sage knows all things are one (equal) and does not judge. Our lives are snarled and jumbled so long as we make conventional discriminations, but when we set them aside, we appear to others as extraordinary and enchanted.

An important theme in the Zhuangzi is the use of immortals to illustrate various points. Did Zhuangzi believe some persons physically lived forever? Well, many Daoists did believe this. Did Zhuangzi believe that our substance was eternal and only our form changed? Almost certainly Zhuangzi thought that we were in a constant state of process, changing from one form into another (see the exchange between Master Lai and Master Li in Ch. 6, The Great and Venerable Teacher). In Daoism, immortality is the result of what is called a wu xing transformation. Wu xing means "five phases" and it refers to the Chinese understanding of reality according to which all things are in some state of combined correlation of wood, fire, water, metal, and earth. This was not a "Daoist" physics. It underlay all Chinese "science" of the classical period, although Daoists certainly made use of it. Zhuangzi wants to teach us how to engage in transformation through meditation, breathing, and experience (see ch. 6). And yet, perhaps Zhuangzi's teachings on immortality mean that the person who is free of discrimination makes no difference between life and death. In the words of Lady Li in Ch. 2, "How do I know that the dead do not wonder why they ever longed for life?"

Huangdi (the Yellow Emperor) is the most prominent immortal mentioned in the text. He had long been venerated as a cultural exemplar and the inventor of civilized human life. Daoism is filled with accounts designed to show that those who learn to live according to the according to the dao have long lives. Pengzu, one of the characters in the Zhuangzi, is said to have lived eight hundred years. The most prominent female immortal is Xiwangmu (Queen Mother of the West), who was believed to reign over the sacred and mysterious Mount Kunlun.

The Daoists did not think of immortality as a gift from a god, or an achievement in the religious sense commonly thought of in the West. It was a result of finding harmony with the dao, expressed through wisdom, meditation, and wu wei. Persons who had such knowledge were reputed to live in the mountains, thus the character for xian (immortal) is made up of two components, the one being shan "mountain" and the other being ren "person." Undoubtedly, some removal to the mountains was a part of the journey to becoming a zhen ren "true person." Because Daoists believed that nature and our own bodies were correlations of each other, they imagined their bodies as mountains inhabited by immortals. The struggle to wu wei was an effort to become immortal, to be born anew, to grow the embryo of immortality inside. A part of the disciplines of Daoism included imitation of the animals of nature, because they were thought to act without the intention and willfulness that characterized humans. Physical exercises included animal dances (wu qin xi) and movements designed to enable the unrestricted flow of the cosmic life force from which all things are made (qi). Other movements designed to channel the flow of qi are called tai qi or qi gong. Daoists practiced breathing exercises, used herbal remedies, and they employed an instruction booklet for sexual positions and intercourse, all designed to enhance the flow of qi energy. They even practiced external alchemy, using burners to modify the composition of cinnabar and mercury into potions to drink and pills to ingest for the purpose of adding longevity. Many Daoist practitioners died as a result of these alchemical substances, and even a few Emperors who followed their instructions lost their lives as well.

The attitude and practices necessary to the pursuit of immortality made this life all the more significant. Butcher Ding is a master butcher because his qi is in harmony with the dao. Daoist practices were meant for everyone, regardless of their origin, gender, social position, or wealth. However, Daoism was a complete philosophy of life and not an easy way to learn.

When superior persons learn the Dao, they practice it with zest.

When average persons learn of the Dao, they are indifferent.

When petty persons learn of the Dao, they laugh loudly.

If they did not laugh, it would not be worthy of being the Dao.

Daodejing, 41

8. Daoism and Confucianism

Arguably, Daoism shared some emphases with classical Confucianism such as self-cultivation and a this-worldly concern for the concrete details of life rather than on abstractions and ideals. Nevertheless, it largely represented an alternative and critical tradition divergent from that of Confucius. While many of these criticisms are controversial, some seem clear.

One of the most fundamental teachings of DDJ is that human discriminations, such as in morality (good, bad) and aesthetics (beauty, ugly) generate the troubles and problems of existence (ch. 3a). The clear implication is that the person following the dao must cease ordering his life according to human-made distinctions (ch. 19). Indeed, it is only when the dao recedes that these demarcations emerge (chs. 18; 38), because they are a form of disease (ch. 74). Daoists believe that the dao is untangling the knots of life, blunting the sharp edges of relationships and problems, and turning down the light on painful occurrences (ch. 4). So, it is best to practice wu-wei in all endeavors, to act naturally and not willfully try to oppose or tamper with how reality is moving.

Confucius and his followers wanted to change the world and be proactive in setting things straight. They wanted to tamper, orchestrate, plan, educate, develop, and propose solutions. Daoists take their hands off of life, and Confucians want their fingerprints on everything. Imagine this comparison. If the Daoist goal is to become like a piece of unhewn and natural wood, the goal of the Confucians is to become a carved sculpture. The Daoists put the piece before us just as it is found, and the Confucians polish it, shape it, and decorate it.

Confucians think they can engineer reality, understand it, name it, control it. But the Daoists think that such endeavors are the source of our frustration and fragmentation (DDJ, chs. 57, 72). They believe the Confucians create a gulf between humans and nature, that weakens and destroys us. Indeed, as far as the Daoists are concerned, the Confucian project is like a cancer that saps our very life. This is a fundamental difference in how these two great philosophical traditions think persons should approach life, and as shown above it is a consistent difference found also between the Zhuangzi and Confucianism.

9. Daoism in the Han

The teachings that were later called Daoism were first known under the name of Huanglao Dao in the 3rd and 2nd cent. BCE. The thought world transmitted in this stream is what Sima Tan meant by Daojia. The Huanglao school was a center of Daoist practitioners in the state of Qi (modern Shandong). Huangdi was the name for the Yellow Emperor, from whom the rulers of Qi said they were descended. When Emperor Wu, the sixth sovereign of the Han dynasty (r. 140-87 BCE) elevated Confucianism to the status of the official state ideology and training in it became mandatory for all bureaucratic officials, the tension with Daoism became more evident. And yet, at court people still sought longevity. Wu continued to engage in many Daoist practices, including the use of alchemy, climbing sacred Taishan (Mt. Tai), and presenting petitions to heaven. Wu forced his Daoist relative Liu An, the Prince of Huainan to commit suicide. Liu's death meant the end of the Daoist academy he had established and which was associated with the production of the work called the Master of Huainan (Huainanzi, 180-122 BCE). The text was an attempt to merge cosmology, Confucian ideals, and a political theory using "quotes" attributed to Huangdi, although the statements are actually from the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. All this is of added significance because in the later Han work, Laozi binahua jing (Book of the Transformations of Laozi) the Chinese physics that persons and objects change forms was employed in order to identify Laozi with Huangdi, and also with taiyi (the ultimate reality or god whose residence was in the Big Dipper). This explains also why the Han bureaucracy became identified with the Big Dipper.

10. Celestial Masters Daoism

Even though Emperor Wu forced Daoist practitioners from court, Daoist teachings were still able to create a discontent with the policies of the Han. Popular uprisings sprouted. The Yellow Turban movement, that tried to overthrow Han imperial authority in the name of Huangdi and promised to establish the Way of Great Peace (Tai ping). The basic moral and philosophical text of this movement was the Classic of Great Peace (Taiping jing). The present version of this work in the Daoist canon is a later and altered iteration of the original text dating about 166 CE.

Easily the most important of the Daoist trends at the end of the Han period was the wudou mi dao (Way of Five Bushels of Rice) movement, best known as the Way of the Celestial Masters (tianshi dao). This movement is traceable to a Daoist hermit named Zhang ling, or Zhang Daoling, who resided on a mountain near modern Chengdu in Sichuan. The story goes that Laozi appeared to Zhang (c. 142 CE) and gave him a commission to announce the soon end of the world and the coming age of Great Peace (taiping). The revelation said that those who followed Zhang would become part of the Orthodox One Covenant with the Powers of the Universe (Zhengyi meng wei). Zhang began the movement that culminated in a Celestial Master state. The administrators of this state were called libationers (ji jiu), because they performed religious rites, as well as political duties. They taught that personal illness and civil mishap were owing to the mismanagement of the forces of the body and nature. The libationers taught a strict form of morality and maintained registers of the moral conduct of the people. They were moral investigators, standing in for a greater celestial bureaucracy. The Celestial Master state developed against the background of the decline of the later Han dynasty. Indeed, when the empire finally decayed, the Celestial Master government was the only order in much of southern China.

When the Wei dynastic rulers became uncomfortable with the Celestial Masters' power, they broke up the state. But this backfired because it actually served to disperse Celestial Masters followers throughout China. Many of the refugees settled near X'ian. The movement remained strong because its leaders had assembled a canon of texts [Statutory Texts of the One and Orthodox (Zhengyi fawen)]. This group of writings included philosophical, political, and ritual texts. It became a fundamental part of the later authorized Daoist canon.

11. Neo-Daoism

The resurgence of Daoism after the Han dynasty is often known as Neo-Daoism. Wang Bi and Guo Xiang who wrote commentaries respectively on the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, were the most important voices in this development. Traditionally, the famous "Seven Sages of the Bamboo Grove" (Zhulin qixian) have also been associated with the new Daoist way of life that expressed itself in culture and not merely in mountain retreats. These thinkers included landscape painters, calligraphers, poets, and musicians. Among the philosophers of this period, the great representative of Daoism in southern China was Ge Hong (283-343 CE). He practiced not only philosophical reflection, but also external alchemy, manipulating mineral substances such as mercury and cinnabar. His work the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity (Baopuzi neipian) is the most important Daoist philosophical work of this period. For him, longevity and immortality are not the same, the former is only the first step to the latter.

12. Shangqing and Lingbao Daoist Movements

After the invasion of China by nomads from Central Asia, Daoists of the Celestial Master tradition who had been living in the north were forced to migrate into southern China, where Ge Hong's version of Daoism was strong. The mixture of these two traditions is represented in the writings of the Xu family. The Xu family was an aristocratic group from what is today the city of Nanjing. Seeking Daoist philosophical wisdom and the long life it promised, many of them moved to Mao Shan mountain, near the city. There they claimed to receive revelations from immortals, who dictated new wisdom and morality texts to them. Yang Xi was the most prominent recipient of the Maoshan revelations (360-370 CE). These revelations came from spirits who were local heroes named the Mao brothers, but they had been transformed into deities. Yang Xi's writings formed the basis for High Purity (Shangqing) Daoism. The writings were extraordinarily well done and even the calligraphy in which they were written was beautiful.

The importance of these texts philosophically speaking is to be found in their idealization of the quest for immortality and transference of the material practices of the alchemical science of Ge Hong into a form of reflective meditation. In fact, the Shangqing school of Daoism is the beginning of the tradition known as "inner alchemy" (neidan), an individual mystical pursuit of wisdom.

Some thirty years after the Maoshan revelations, a descendent of Ge Hong, named Ge Chaofu went into a mediumistic trance and authored a set of texts called the Lingbao teachings. These works were ritual recitation texts similar to Buddhist sutras, and indeed they borrowed heavily from Buddhism. At first, the Shangqing and Lingbao texts belonged to the general stream of the Celestial Masters and were not considered separate sects or movements within Daoism, although later lineages of masters emphasized the uniqueness of their teachings.

13. Tang Daoism

As the Lingbao texts illustrate, Daoism acted as a receiving structure for Buddhism. Many early translators of Buddhist texts used Daoist terms to render Indian ideas. Some Buddhists saw Laozi as an avatar of Shakyamuni (the Buddha), and some Daoists understood Shakyamuni as a manifestation of the dao, which also means he was a manifestation of Laozi. An often made generalization is that Buddhism held north China in the 4th and 5th centuries, and Daoism the south. But gradually this intellectual currency actually reversed. Daoism grew in scope and impact throughout China.

By the time of the Tang dynasty (618-906 CE) Daoism was the intellectual philosophy that underwrote the national understanding. The imperial family claimed to descend from Li (the family of Laozi). Laozi was venerated by royal decree. Officials received Daoist initiation as Masters of its philosophy, rituals, and practices. A major center for Daoist studies was created at Dragon and Tiger Mountain (long hu shan), chosen both for its feng shui and because of its strategic location at the intersection of numerous southern China trade routes. The Celestial Masters who held leadership at Dragon and Tiger mountain were later called "Daoist popes" by Christian missionaries because they had considerable political power.

In aesthetics, two great Daoist intellectuals worked during the Tang. Wu Daozi developed the rules for Daoist painting and Li Bai became its most famous poet. Interestingly, Daoist alchemists invented gunpowder during the Tang. The earliest block-print book on a scientific subject is a Daoist work entitled Xuanjie lu (850 CE). As Buddhism gradually grew stronger during the Tang, Daoist and Confucian intellectuals sought to initiate a conversation with it. The Buddhism that resulted was a reformed version known as Chan (Zen in Japan).

14. The Three Teachings

During the Five Dynasties (907-960 CE) and Song periods (960-1279 CE) Confucianism enjoyed a resurgence and Daoists found their place by teaching that principal thinkers of their tradition were Confucian scholars as well. Most notable among these was Lu Dongbin, a Daoist immortal that many believed was originally a Confucian teacher.

Daoism became a complete philosophy of life, reaching into religion, social action, and individual health and physical well being. A huge network of Daoist temples known by the name Dongyue Miao (also called tianqing guan) was created through the empire, with a miao in virtually every town of any size. The Daoist masters who served these temples were appointed as government officials. They also gave medical, moral, and philosophical advice, and led religious rituals, dedicated especially to the Lord of the Sacred Mountain of the East named Taishan. Daoist masters had wide authority. All this was obvious in the temple iconography. Taishan was represented as the emperor, the City God (cheng huang) was a high official, and the Earth God was portrayed as a prosperous peasant. Daoism of this period integrated the Three Teachings (sanjiao) of China: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism. This process of synthesis continued throughout the Song and into the period of the Ming Dynasty.

Such a wide dispersal of Daoist thought and practice, taken together with its interest in merging Confucianism and Buddhism, eventually created a fragmented ideology. Into this confusion came Wang Zhe (1113-1170 CE), the founder of Quanzhen (Total Truth) Daoism. It was Wang's goal to bring the three teachings into a single great synthesis. For the first time, Daoist teachers adopted monastic forms of life, created monasteries, and organized themselves in ways they saw in Buddhism. This version of Daoist thought interpreted the classical texts of the DDJ and the Zhuangzi to call for a rejection of the body and material world. The Quanzhen order became powerful as the main partner of the Mongols (Yuan dynasty), who gave their patronage to its expansion. Frequently the Mongol emperors favored the Celestial Masters and their leader at Dragon and Tiger mountain in an effort to undermine the power of the Quanzhen leaders. For example, the Zhengyi (Celestial Master) master of Beijing in the 1220s was Zhang Liusun. Under patronage he was allowed to build a Dongyue Miao in the city in 1223 and make it the unofficial town hall of the capital. But by the time of Khubilai Khan (r. 1260-1294) the Buddhists were used against all Daoists. The Khan ordered all Daoist books except the DDJ to be destroyed in 1281, and he closed the Quanzhen monastery in the city known as Baiyun Guan (White Cloud Monastery).

When the Ming (1368-1644) dynasty emerged, the Mongols were expulsed, and Chinese rule was restored. The emperors sponsored the creation of the first complete Daoist Canon (Daozang), which was edited between 1408 and 1445. This was an eclectic collection, including many Buddhist and Confucian related texts. Daoist influence reached its zenith.

15. The "Destruction" of Daoism

The Manchurian tribes that became rulers of China in 1644 and founded the Qing dynasty were already under the influence of conservative Confucian exiles. They stripped the Celestial Master of Dragon Tiger Mountain of his power at court. Only Quanzhen was tolerated. Baiyun Guan (White Cloud Monastery) was reopened, and a new lineage of thinkers was organized. They called themselves the Dragon Gate lineage (Long men pai). In the 1780s, the Western traders arrived, and so did Christian missionaries. In 1849, the Hakka people of Guangxi province, among China's poorest citizens, rose in revolt. They followed Hong Xiuquan, who claimed to be Jesus' younger brother. This millennial movement built on a strange version of Chinese Christianity sought to establish the Heavenly Kingdom of Peace (taping). As the Taiping swept throughout southern China, they destroyed Buddhist and Daoist temples and texts wherever they found them. The Taiping army completely raised the Daoist complexes on Dragon Tiger Mountain. During most of the 20th century the drive to eradicate Daoist influence has continued. In the 1920s, the "New Life" movement drafted students to go out on Sundays to destroy Daoist statues and texts. In the year 1926 only two copies of the Daoist Canon (Daozang) existed and Daoist philosophical heritage was in great jeopardy. But permission was granted to copy the canon kept at the White Cloud Monastery, and so the texts were preserved for the world. There are 1120 titles in this collection in 5,305 volumes. Much of this material has yet to receive scholarly attention and very little of it has been translated into any Western language.

The Cultural Revolution (1966-1976) attempted to complete the destruction of Daoism. Masters were killed or "re-educated." Entire lineages were broken up and their texts were destroyed. The miaos were closed, burned, and turned into military barracks. At one time, there were 300 Daoist sites in Beijing alone, now there are only a handful. However, Daoism is not dead. It survives as a vibrant philosophical system and way of life as its evidenced by the revival of its practice and study in several new University institutes in the People's Republic.

16. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger and Hall, David. (2003). Daodejing: "Making This Life Significant" A Philosophical Translation. New York: Ballantine Books.
  • Ames, Roger. (1998). Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Bokenkamp, Stephen R. (1997). Early Daoist Scriptures. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Boltz, Judith M. (1987). A Survey of Taoist Literature: Tenth to Seventeenth Centuries, China Research Monograph 32. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Chan, Alan. (1991). Two Visions of the Way: A Translation and Study of the Heshanggong and Wang Bi Commentaries on the Laozi. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Creel, Herrlee G. (1970). What is Taoism? Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mark and Ivanhoe, Philip J., eds. (1999). Religious and Philosophical Aspects of the Laozi. Albany: State University of New York.
  • Girardot, Norman J. (1983). Myth and Meaning in Early Taoism: The Theme of Chaos (hun-tun). Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Graham, Angus. (1981). Chuang tzu: The Inner Chapters. London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Graham, Angus. (1989). Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court.
  • Graham, Angus. (1979). "How much of the Chuang-tzu Did Chuang-tzu Write?" Journal of the American Academy of Religion, Vol. 47, No. 3.
  • Hansen, Chad (1992). A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Henricks, Robert. (1989). Lao-Tzu: Te-Tao Ching. New York: Ballantine.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. (2002). The Daodejing of Laozi. New York: Seven Bridges Press.
  • Kjellberg, Paul and Ivanhoe, Philip J., eds. (1996) Essays on Skepticism, Relativism, and Ethics in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York.
  • Kohn, Livia and LaFargue, Michael., eds. (1998). Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Kohn, Livia and Roth, Harold., eds. (2002). Daoist Identity: History, Lineage, and Ritual. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.
  • LaFargue, Michael. (1992). The Tao of the Tao-te-ching. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Lin, Paul J. (1977). A Translation of Lao-tzu's Tao-te-ching and Wang Pi's Commentary. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan.
  • Lau, D.C. (1982). Chinese Classics: Tao Te Ching. Hong Kong: Hong Kong University Press.
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Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.

Ge Hong (Ko Hung, 283—343 C.E.)

Ge_HongGe Hong was an eclectic philosopher who dedicated his life to searching for physical immortality, which he thought was attainable through alchemy. He lived during China's tumultuous Period of Disunity (220-589 C.E.), a time in which alien conqueror regimes ruled northern China, the cradle of Chinese civilization, while a series of weak, transplanted Chinese states occupied recently colonized southern China. These political conditions, along with the social chaos they engendered, no doubt gave rise to Ge Hong's ardent desire to establish order and permanency in both his spiritual and secular worlds. His most important contribution to Chinese philosophy was his attempt to reconcile an immortality-centered Daoism with Confucianism. Equally important, to establish political order, he also tried to reconcile Legalism with Confucianism. His penetrating insight was that the teachings of no one school could solve the problems that his world faced – only a combination of the best methods of each could do so.

Table of Contents

  1. The Life of Ge Hong
  2. Immortality
  3. Reconciliation of Daoism and Confucianism
  4. Confucianism and Legalism
  5. The Importance of Broad Knowledge
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Life of Ge Hong

In 283 C.E., Ge Hong was born into a southern magnate family whose native place was the Jurong district in Danyang prefecture, which was near Nanjing, in the southwest corner of present day Jiangsu province. Both his grandfather and father had reputations for broad learning and served as high ministers for the Wu state, which ruled over southeastern China from 220-280. Ge's father continued to hold a number of middle level positions under the Western Jin dynasty (265-317) that briefly reunited China. Upon his father's death in 296, Ge endured a period of relative poverty and lost his family's extensive library due to civil strife. To educate himself, from this time on, he started copying books and reading voraciously. He began with the Confucian classics, but soon turned his attention to the various philosophical writings. Under the tutelage of Zheng Yin, who was both a Confucian classicist and a Daoist adept, Ge began his studies of the immortality arts. Zheng Yin himself was a disciple of Ge's uncle, Ge Xuan (164-244), a Daoist adept who was reputed to have become an immortal.

Like other southern gentry, Ge Hong's early career was spent in military positions. He had an extensive knowledge of martial affairs and was trained in the use of arms. In 303, at the age of twenty, he was called upon to organize and lead a militia in his native place against a rebel army, which he handily defeated. In a rare admission of violence for a Chinese literatus, he even relates that, with bow and arrow, two men and a horse died at his hands. In 305, after being promoted to the rank of a General Who Makes the Waves Submit, Ge tried to make his way to Luoyang, the capital. Although his autobiography tells us he did so "to look for unusual books," he was probably also hoping to obtain a promotion. However, due to the Rebellion of the Eight Princes that was being fought throughout northern China, he never made it; instead, he wandered throughout southern China. To escape from the turmoil that was embroiling the rest of China, he finally accepted a position as a military councilor under his friend who was appointed to be the governor of Guangzhou (Canton), a port city in the far south.

After his patron was killed enroute to assuming the governorship, Ge refused many other military appointments and remained in Guangzhou for the next eight years, living the life of a recluse at nearby Mount Luofu. In 314, he returned to his native place of Jurong. There, he studied under another Daoist adept named Bao Qing (260-330), the former governor of Nanhai prefecture, who was so impressed that he gave Ge his eldest daughter in marriage. It was during this long period of reclusion that Ge wrote his two part magnum opus whose title bore his sobriquet: the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity and the Outer Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity. Ge used the Daoist Inner Chapters to substantiate the reality of immortality and convey the methods for realizing it, while the Confucian Outer Chapters describe the problems afflicting the secular world and his proposed solutions. In fact, until the fourteenth century, the Inner Chapters and Outer Chapters circulated independently from each other. With these two works, Ge aspired to establish his own school of philosophy. Also at this time, illustrative of his aspirations, Ge compiled hagiographical works entitled Biographies of Divine Transcedents and Biographies of Recluses.

With the establishment of the Eastern Jin dynasty in southern China in 317, the transplanted throne was eager to gain the allegiance of powerful southern gentry families; thus, men such as Ge Hong were showered with official appointments, which were usually more honorary than substantive in nature. In recognition of his past military successes, Ge himself was given the title of Marquis of the Region Within the Pass. Finally, in 326, Wang Dao (276-339), the prime minister, appointed him to a series of positions, ending with that of military advisor. By 332, due to his advanced age (he was 50) and desire to find ingredients for immortality elixirs, he begged to be given a post in northern part of present-day Vietnam. On his way there, the governor of Guangzhou, Deng Yue, detained him there indefinitely. He thus took up residence at nearby Mount Luofu where he engaged in immortality practices until his death in 343.

By his own admission, Ge Hong was a man that was out of sorts with his age. He was a southerner in an age where only northern émigrés were given posts of substance. Due to his lack of verbal eloquence, he could never obtain social prestige in the salons where men were prized for their ability to engage in "Pure Talk" - abstract philosophical discussions. Nor did his strong Confucian sense of morality sit well with the libertine tendencies of that prevailed among the northern émigrés. The outlet of his frustrations became his writings, in which he attacked the fashions and trends of his day and proposed his own vision of how people should obtain stability in an instable world.

2. Immortality

Ge Hong wholeheartedly believed that anyone, through unrelenting effort and study, could obtain immortality. One does not have to be either rich or powerful to do so; in fact, wealth and position are harmful because they inhibit one from attaining the necessary moral and physical serenity. Moreover, it is not up to the arbitrary decisions of deities to extend our lives - they are merely divine administrators who keep track of our sins and good deeds; consequently, sacrifices and prayers to them for this purpose are useless. Thus, whether one can obtain immortality is entirely based on his or her own diligence and determination. It was precisely for those educated people who wanted and were willing to work towards obtaining immortality that Ge wrote his Inner Chapters. The overriding importance that he attached to obtaining eternal life is evident in that the inner, and thereby his most important, chapters of his magnum opus were dedicated to the topic.

Ge Hong firmly believed that physical immortality was possible. This is because all things are permeated by the metaphysical oneness, xuan (the mystery), which creates and animates all things. Significantly, for Ge, xuan is synonymous with the words dao (the way, the ultimate reality) and yi (the one, the unity). In this light, he describes xuan in the following manner: it "carries within it the embryo of the Original One, it forms and shapes the two Principles (Yin and Yang); it exhales and absorbs the great Genesis, it inspires and transforms the multitude of species, it makes constellations go round, it shaped the primordial Darkness, it guides the wonderful mainspring of the universe, it exhales the four seasons … if one adds to it, it does not increase. If one takes away from it, it does not grow less. If something is given to it, it is not increased in glory. If something is taken from it, it does not suffer. Where the Mystery is present, joy is infinite; where the Mystery has departed, efficacy is exhausted and the spirit disappears" (Robinet, 82-83). In other words, the key to immortality is maintaining this everlasting oneness within oneself - if one cannot do so, he or she will soon die. The reason why people lose it is that they become attached through their desires to the outside world, thereby forgetting the jewel that resides within. As Ge put it, "The way of xuan is obtained within oneself, but is lost due to things outside oneself. Those who employ xuan are gods; those who forget it are merely [empty] vessels."

How does one maintain the unity within oneself? For Ge Hong it had much to do with preserving, enhancing, and refining one's qi, which for him embodied the metaphysical mystery. Qi, which originally meant "breath" or "vapor," came to designate the vital energy that exists within and animates all things. As Ge Hong relates, "people reside within qi and qi resides within people. From heaven and earth down to the ten thousand things, each one requires qi to live. As for those who excel at circulating their qi, internally they are able to nourish their body; externally, they are able to repel illnesses." Since each person receives a finite amount of qi at birth, he recommends various methods to retain and enhance it, which include breathing exercises, sexual techniques, calisthenics, dietary restrictions, and the ingestion of herbal medicines. Since none of these methods is infallible, he recommends that an adept should practice a number of them in combination with each other. By doing so, one protects oneself from manifold disasters, such as illnesses, demons, savage beasts and weapons, while also lessening desires, transforming the body, and extending one's lifespan. These methods could even give their practitioners supernatural powers, such as curing illnesses, raising the dead, seeing the future, commanding gods and ghosts, forgoing food for years, and the ability to disappear.

Nevertheless, none of these techniques could permanently keep xuan within oneself. To do that, nothing was comparable with taking alchemically created medicines. Ge thus informs us that, "Even if one performs breathing exercises and calisthenics, as well as ingests herbal medicines, this can only extend the years of your lifespan, but it will not save you from death. Ingesting divine cinnabar will make your lifespan inexhaustible. You will last as long as heaven and earth, be able to travel on clouds and ride dragons, and ascend at will to the Heaven of Highest Clarity." Alchemically derived medicines, the best of which contained either liquefied gold or reverted cinnabar, were able to have this marvelous effect because the substances from which they were made had shown themselves, through repeated firings in the alchemist's stove, to be impervious to decay or dissolution. According to Ge, "As for forging of gold and cinnabar, the longer one burns them, the more marvelous their transformations. When gold enters the flames, even after one hundred firings, it will not disappear. If you bury it forever, it will never decay. If one ingests these two substances, they will refine that person's body, and make it so that he or she will neither age nor die." In other words, one makes one's own body imperishable by ingesting imperishable things. Mechanically what happens is that, upon ingestion, these substances seep into one's blood and qi, thereby making them stronger. Ge Hong calls this using an outside substance to fortify one's self. The reason why herbs are inferior to gold and cinnabar is that they are perishable; thus, they lack the capacity to make the body imperishable. Unfortunately though, the ingredients for making these mineral medicines are difficult to obtain, the process of smelting them is arduous, and the ritual circumstances under which they must be made are elaborate; as a result, Ge Hong several times admits that he has never had enough resources to attempt to produce these superb formulas.

3.Reconciliation of Daoism and Confucianism

It is often said of premodern Chinese literati that they were Daoist at home while Confucian in the office. Ge Hong was in fact probably one of the first Chinese thinkers to consciously try to reconcile Confucianism and Daoism. As the division of his major work into inner and outer chapters indicates, he did so by asserting that Confucianism and Daoism addressed different aspects of life. Confucianism addressed the external world and provided means by which to ameliorate its many problems; Daoism concerned the inner world and provided means by which to attain immortality. As Ge succinctly put it, "For an extraordinarily talented person, what difficulty could there be in practicing both (Confucianism and Daoism) at the same time? Inwardly, such people treasure the way of nourishing life; outwardly, they exhibit their brilliance in the world. If they regulate their persons, their persons then will be cultivated for a prolonged time; if they rule the country, the country will achieve the state of great peace." Cultivating one's spirit for immortality thereby automatically enables one to rule a country well. Thus, if one becomes a terrestrial immortal, Ge Hong sees no reason why such a person cannot hold office and contribute to the welfare of his generation.

Nevertheless, even though both were important, Daoism was even more so. That is because in the far past the sage kings followed the Dao "the oneness" or "the natural order of things," as a result, the people's conduct was flawless and natural processes transpired smoothly without disruption or disaster. Later kings, however, no longer followed the Dao; consequently, natural disasters occurred frequently and people became evil and unruly. It was only at this point that Confucianism was introduced in an attempt to rectify this situation. Thus, Daoism is superior because it kept the world from becoming chaotic; Confucianim, on the other hand, only appeared when the world declined into disorder and its practitioners have often become entangled in the resulting mess. Thus, Daoists, like Confucians, provide the world with moral order, but they do so without becoming soiled in the process. As Ge Hong put it, "In regard to the Daoists, their making consists of