Category Archives: Continental Philosophy

Continental Rationalism

Continental rationalism is a retrospective category used to group together certain philosophers working in continental Europe in the 17th and 18th centuries, in particular, Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, especially as they can be regarded in contrast with representatives of “British empiricism,” most notably, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Whereas the British empiricists held that all knowledge has its origin in, and is limited by, experience, the Continental rationalists thought that knowledge has its foundation in the scrutiny and orderly deployment of ideas and principles proper to the mind itself. The rationalists did not spurn experience as is sometimes mistakenly alleged; they were thoroughly immersed in the rapid developments of the new science, and in some cases led those developments. They held, however, that experience alone, while useful in practical matters, provides an inadequate foundation for genuine knowledge.

The fact that “Continental rationalism” and “British empiricism” are retrospectively applied terms does not mean that the distinction that they signify is anachronistic. Leibniz’s New Essays on Human Understanding, for instance, outlines stark contrasts between his own way of thinking and that of Locke, which track many features of the rationalist/empiricist distinction as it tends to be applied in retrospect. There was no rationalist creed or manifesto to which Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, all subscribed (nor, for that matter, was there an empiricist one). Nevertheless, with due caution, it is possible to use the “Continental rationalism” category (and its empiricist counterpart) to highlight significant points of convergence in the philosophies of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, inter alia. These include: (1) a doctrine of innate ideas; (2) the application of mathematical method to philosophy; and (3) the use of a priori principles in the construction of substance-based metaphysical systems.

Table of Contents

  1. Origin and History of the Term "Rationalism"
  2. Innate Ideas
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
    4. Malebranche
  3. Mathematical Method
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
  4. A Priori Principles
    1. Intelligibility and the Cartesian Circle
    2. Substance Metaphysics
      1. Descartes
      2. Spinoza
      3. Leibniz
  5. Continental Rationalism, Experience, and Experiment
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Origin and History of the Term "Rationalism"

According to the Historisches Worterbuch der Philosophie, the word “rationaliste” appears in 16th century France, as early as 1539, in opposition to “empirique.” In his New Organon, first published in 1620 (in Latin), Francis Bacon juxtaposes rationalism and empiricism in memorable terms:

Those who have treated of the sciences have been either empiricists [Empirici] or dogmatists [Dogmatici]. Empiricists [Empirici], like ants, simply accumulate and use; Rationalists [Rationales], like spiders, spin webs from themselves; the way of the bee is in between: it takes material from the flowers of the garden and the field; but it has the ability to convert and digest them. (The New Organon, p. 79; Spedding, 1, 201)

Bacon’s association of rationalists with dogmatists in this passage foreshadows Kant’s use of the term “dogmatisch” in reference, especially, to the Wolffian brand of rationalist philosophy prevalent in 18th century Germany. Nevertheless, Bacon’s use of “rationales” does not refer to “Continental rationalism,” which developed only after the New Organon, but rather to the Scholastic philosophy that dominated the medieval period. Moreover, while Bacon is, in retrospect, often considered the father of modern empiricism, the above-quoted passage shows him no friendlier to the empirici than to the rationales. Thus, Bacon’s juxtaposition of rationalism and empiricism should not be confused with the distinction as it develops over the course of the 17th and 18th centuries, although his imagery is certainly suggestive.

The distinction appears in an influential form as the backdrop to Kant’s critical philosophy (which is often loosely understood as a kind of synthesis of certain aspects of Continental rationalism and British empiricism) at the end of the 18th century. However, it was not until the time of Hegel in the first half of the 19th century that the terms “rationalism” and “empiricism” were applied to separating the figures of the 17th and 18th centuries into contrasting epistemological camps in the fashion with which we are familiar today. In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, Hegel describes an opposition between “a priori thought,” on the one hand, according to which “the determinations which should be valid for thought should be taken from thought itself,” and, on the other hand, “the determination that we must begin and end and think, etc., from experience.” He describes this as the opposition between “Rationalismus and “Empirismus” (Werke 20, 121).

2. Innate Ideas

Perhaps the best recognized and most commonly made distinction between rationalists and empiricists concerns the question of the source of ideas. Whereas rationalists tend to think (with some exceptions discussed below) that some ideas, at least, such as the idea of God, are innate, empiricists hold that all ideas come from experience. Although the rationalists tend to be remembered for their positive doctrine concerning innate ideas, their assertions are matched by a rejection of the notion that all ideas can be accounted for on the basis of experience alone. In some Continental rationalists, especially in Spinoza, the negative doctrine is more apparent than the positive. The distinction is worth bearing in mind, in order to avoid the very false impression that the rationalists held to innate ideas because the empiricist alternative had not come along yet. (In general, the British empiricists came after the rationalists.) The Aristotelian doctrine, nihil in intellectu nisi prius in sensu (nothing in the intellect unless first in the senses), had been dominant for centuries, and it was in reaction against this that the rationalists revived in modified form the contrasting Platonic doctrine of innate ideas.

a. Descartes

Descartes distinguishes between three kinds of ideas: adventitious (adventitiae), factitious (factae), and innate (innatae). As an example of an adventitious idea, Descartes gives the common idea of the sun (yellow, bright, round) as it is perceived through the senses. As an example of a factitious idea, Descartes cites the idea of the sun constructed via astronomical reasoning (vast, gaseous body). According to Descartes, all ideas which represent “true, immutable, and eternal essences” are innate. Innate ideas, for Descartes, include the idea of God, the mind, and mathematical truths, such as the fact that it pertains to the nature of a triangle that its three angles equal two right angles.

By conceiving some ideas as innate, Descartes does not mean that children are born with fully actualized conceptions of, for example, triangles and their properties. This is a common misconception of the rationalist doctrine of innate ideas. Descartes strives to correct it in Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, where he compares the innateness of ideas in the mind to the tendency which some babies are born with to contract certain diseases: “it is not so much that the babies of such families suffer from these diseases in their mother’s womb, but simply that they are born with a certain ‘faculty’ or tendency to contract them” (CSM I, 304). In other words, innate ideas exist in the mind potentially, as tendencies; they are then actualized by means of active thought under certain circumstances, such as seeing a triangular figure.

At various points, Descartes defends his doctrine of innate ideas against philosophers (Hobbes, Gassendi, and Regius, inter alia) who hold that all ideas enter the mind through the senses, and that there are no ideas apart from images. Descartes is relatively consistent on his reasons for thinking that some ideas, at least, must be innate. His principal line of argument proceeds by showing that there are certain ideas, for example, the idea of a triangle, that cannot be either adventitious or factitious; since ideas are either adventitious, factitious, or innate, by process of elimination, such ideas must be innate.

Take Descartes’ favorite example of the idea of a triangle. The argument that the idea of a triangle cannot be adventitious proceeds roughly as follows. A triangle is composed of straight lines. However, straight lines never enter our mind via the senses, since when we examine straight lines under a magnifying lens, they turn out to be wavy or irregular in some way. Since we cannot derive the idea of straight lines from the senses, we cannot derive the idea of a true triangle, which is made up of straight lines, through the senses. Sometimes Descartes makes the point in slightly different terms by insisting that there is “no similarity” between the corporeal motions of the sense organs and the ideas formed in the mind on the occasion of those motions (CSM I, 304; CSMK III, 187). One such dissimilarity, which is particularly striking, is the contrast between the particularity of all corporeal motions and the universality that pure ideas can attain when conjoined to form necessary truths. Descartes makes this point in clear terms to Regius:

I would like our author to tell me what the corporeal motion is that is capable of forming some common notion to the effect that ‘things which are equal to a third thing are equal to each other,’ or any other he cares to take. For all such motions are particular, whereas the common notions are universal and bear no affinity with, or relation to, the motions. (CSM I, 304-5)

Next, Descartes has to show that the idea of a triangle is not factitious. This is where the doctrine of “true and immutable natures” comes in. For Descartes, if, for example, the idea that the three angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles were his own invention, it would be mutable, like the idea of a gold mountain, which can be changed at whim into the idea of a silver mountain. Instead, when Descartes thinks about his idea of a triangle, he is able to discover eternal properties of it that are not mutable in this way; hence, they are not invented (CSMK III, 184).

Since, therefore, the triangle can be neither adventitious nor factitious, it must be innate; that is to say, the mind has an innate tendency or power to form this idea from its own purely intellectual resources when prompted to do so.

Descartes’ insistence that there is no similarity between the corporeal motions of our sense organs and the ideas formed in the mind on the occasion of those motions raises a difficulty for understanding how any ideas could be adventitious. Since none of our ideas have any similarity to the corporeal motions of the sense organs – even the idea of motion itself – it seems that no ideas can in fact have their origin in a source external to the mind. The reason that we have an idea of heat in the presence of fire, for instance, is not, then, because the idea is somehow transmitted by the fire. Rather, Descartes thinks that God designed us in such a way that we form the idea of heat on the occasion of certain corporeal motions in our sense organs (and we form other sensory ideas on the occasion of other corporeal motions). Thus, there is a sense in which, for Descartes, all ideas are innate, and his tripartite division between kinds of ideas becomes difficult to maintain.

b. Spinoza

Per his so-called doctrine of “parallelism,” Spinoza conceives the mind and the body as one and the same thing, conceived under different attributes (to wit, thought and extension). (See Benedict de Spinoza: Metaphysics.) As a result, Spinoza denies that there is any causal interaction between mind and body, and so Spinoza denies that any ideas are caused by bodily change. Just as bodies can be affected only by other bodies, so ideas can be affected only by other ideas. This does not mean, however, that all ideas are innate for Spinoza, as they very clearly are for Leibniz (see below). Just as the body can be conceived to be affected by external objects conceived under the attribute of extension (that is, as bodies), so the mind can (as it were, in parallel) be conceived to be affected by the same objects conceived under the attribute of thought (that is, as ideas). Ideas gained in this way, from encounters with external objects (conceived as ideas) constitutes knowledge of the first kind, or “imagination,” for Spinoza, and all such ideas are “inadequate,” or in other words, confused and lacking order for the intellect. “Adequate ideas,” on the other hand, which can be formed via Spinoza’s second and third kinds of knowledge (reason and intuitive knowledge, respectively), and which are clear and distinct and have order for the intellect, are not gained through chance encounters with external objects; rather, adequate ideas can be explained in terms of resources intrinsic to the mind. (For more on Spinoza’s three kinds of knowledge and the distinction between adequate and inadequate ideas, see Benedict de Spinoza: Epistemology.)

The mind, for Spinoza, just by virtue of having ideas, which is its essence, has ideas of what Spinoza calls “common notions,” or in other words, those things which are “equally in the part and in the whole.” Examples of common notions include motion and rest, extension, and indeed God. Take extension for example. To think of any body – however small or however large – is to have a perfectly complete idea of extension. So, insofar as the mind has any idea of body (and, for Spinoza, the human mind is the idea of the human body, and so always has ideas of body), it has a perfectly adequate idea of extension. The same can be said for motion and rest. The same can also be said for God, except that God is not equally in the part and in the whole of extension only, but of all things. Spinoza treats these common notions as principles of reasoning. Anything that can be deduced on their basis is also adequate.

It is not clear if Spinoza’s common notions should be considered innate ideas. Spinoza speaks of active and passive ideas, and adequate and inadequate ideas. He associates the former with the intellect and the latter with the imagination, but “innate idea” is not an explicit category in Spinoza’s theory of ideas as it is in Descartes’ and also Leibniz’s. Common notions are not “in” the mind independent of the mind’s relation with its object (the body); nevertheless, since it is the mind’s nature to be the idea of the body, it is part of the mind’s nature to have common notions. Commentators differ over the question of whether Spinoza had a positive doctrine of innate ideas; it is clear, however, that he denied that all ideas come about through encounters with external objects; moreover, he believed that those ideas which do come about through encounters with external objects are of an inferior epistemic value than those produced through the mind’s own intrinsic resources; this is enough to put him in the rationalist camp on the question of the origin of ideas.

c. Leibniz

Of the three great rationalists, Leibniz propounded the most thoroughgoing doctrine of innate ideas. For Leibniz, all ideas are strictly speaking innate. In a general and relatively straightforward sense, this viewpoint is a direct consequence of Leibniz’s conception of individual substance. According to Leibniz, “each substance is a world apart, independent of everything outside of itself except for God. Thus all our phenomena, that is to say, all the things that can ever happen to us, are only the results of our own being” (L, 312); or, in Leibniz’s famous phrase from the Monadology, “monads have no windows,” meaning there is no way for sensory data to enter monads from the outside. In this more general sense, then, to give an explanation for Leibniz’s doctrine of innate ideas would be to explain his conception of individual substance and the arguments and considerations which motivate it. (See Section 4, b, iii, below for a discussion of Leibniz’s conception of substance; see also Gottfried Leibniz: Metaphysics.) This would be to circumvent the issues and questions which are typically at the heart of the debate over the existence of innate ideas, which concern the extent to which certain kinds of perceptions, ideas, and propositions can be accounted for on the basis of experience. Although Leibniz’s more general reasons for embracing innate ideas stem from his unique brand of substance metaphysics, Leibniz does enter into the debate over innate ideas, as it were, addressing the more specific questions regarding the source of given kinds of ideas, most notably in his dialogic engagement with Locke’s philosophy, New Essays on Human Understanding.

Due to Leibniz’s conception of individual substance, nothing actually comes from a sensory experience, where a sensory experience is understood to involve direct concourse with things outside of the mind. However, Leibniz does have a means for distinguishing between sensations and purely intellectual thoughts within the framework of his substance metaphysics. For Leibniz, although each monad or individual substance “expresses” (or represents) the entire universe from its own unique point of view, it does so with a greater or lesser degree of clarity and distinctness. Bare monads, such as comprise minerals and vegetation, express the rest of the world only in the most confused fashion. Rational minds, by contrast, have a much greater proportion of clear and distinct perceptions, and so express more of the world clearly and distinctly than do bare monads. When an individual substance attains a more perfect expression of the world (in the sense that it attains a less confused expression of the world), it is said to act; when its expression becomes more confused, it is said to be acted upon. Using this distinction, Leibniz is able to reconcile the terms of his philosophy with everyday conceptions. Although, strictly speaking, no monad is acted upon by any other, nor acts upon any other directly, it is possible to speak this way, just as, Leibniz says, Copernicans can still speak of the motion of the sun for everyday purposes, while understanding that the sun does not in fact move. It is in this sense that Leibniz enters into the debate concerning the origin of our ideas.

Leibniz distinguishes between “ideas” (idées) and “thoughts” (pensées) (or, sometimes, “notions” (notions) or “concepts” (conceptus)). Ideas exist in the soul whether we actually perceive them or are aware of them or not. It is these “ideas” that Leibniz contends are innate. “Thoughts,” by contrast is Leibniz’s designation for ideas which we actually form or conceive at any given time. In this sense, “thoughts” can be formed on the basis of a sensory experience (with the above caveats regarding the meaning a sensory experience can have in Leibniz’s thought) or on the basis of an internal experience, or a reflection. Leibniz alternatively characterizes our “ideas” as “aptitudes,” “preformations,” and as “dispositions” to represent something when the occasion for thinking of it arises. On multiple occasions, Leibniz uses the metaphor of the veins present in marble to illustrate his understanding of innate ideas. Just as the veins dispose the sculptor to shape the marble in certain ways, so do our ideas dispose us to have certain thoughts on the occasion of certain experiences.

Leibniz rejects the view that the mind cannot have ideas without being aware that it has them. (See Gottfried Leibniz: Philosophy of Mind.) Much of the disagreement between Locke and Leibniz on the question of innate ideas turns on this point, since Locke (at least as Leibniz represents him in the New Essays) is not able to make any sense out of the notion that the mind can have ideas without being aware of them. Much of Leibniz’s defense of his innate ideas doctrine takes the form of replying to Locke’s charge that it is absurd to hold that the mind could think (that is, have ideas) without being aware of it.

Leibniz marshals several considerations in support of his view that the mind is not always aware of its ideas. The fact that we can store many more ideas in our understanding than we can be aware of at any given time is one. Leibniz also points to the phenomenology of attention; we do not attend to everything in our perceptual field at any given time; rather we focus on certain things at the expense of others. To convey a sense of what it might be like for the mind to have perceptions and ideas in a dreamless sleep, Leibniz asks the reader to imagine subtracting our attention from perceptual experience; since we can distinguish between what is attended to and what is not, subtracting attention does not eliminate perception altogether.

While such considerations suggest the possibility of innate ideas, they do not in and of themselves prove that innate ideas are necessary to explain the full scope of human cognition. The empiricist tends to think that if innate ideas are not necessary to explain cognition, then they should be abandoned as gratuitous metaphysical constructs. Leibniz does have arguments designed to show that innate ideas are needed for a full account of human cognition.

In the first place, Leibniz recalls favorably the famous scenario from Plato’s Meno where Socrates teaches a slave boy to grasp abstract mathematical truths merely by asking questions. The anecdote is supposed to indicate that mathematical truths can be generated by the mind alone, in the absence of particular sensory experiences, if only the mind is prompted to discover what it contains within itself. Concerning mathematics and geometry, Leibniz remarks: “one could construct these sciences in one’s study and even with one’s eyes closed, without learning from sight or even from touch any of the needed truths” (NE, 77). So, on these grounds, Leibniz contends that without innate ideas, we could not explain the sorts of cognitive capacities exhibited in the mathematical sciences.

A second argument concerns our capacity to grasp certain necessary or eternal truths. Leibniz says that necessary truths can be suggested, justified, and confirmed by experience, but that they can be proved only by the understanding alone (NE, 80). Leibniz does not explain this point further, but he seems to have in mind the point later made by both Hume and Kant (to different ends), that experience on its own can never account for the kind of certainty that we find in mathematical and metaphysical truths. For Leibniz, if it can be granted that we can be certain of propositions in mathematics and metaphysics – and Leibniz thinks this must be granted – recourse must be had to principles innate to the mind in order to explain our ability to be certain of such things.

d. Malebranche

It is worth noting briefly the position of Nicolas Malebranche on innate ideas, since Malebranche is often considered among the rationalists, yet he denied the doctrine of innate ideas. Malebranche’s reasons for rejecting innate ideas were anything but empiricist in nature, however. His leading objection stems from the infinity of ideas that the mind is able to form independently of the senses; as an example, Malebranche cites the infinite number of triangles of which the mind could in principle, albeit not in practice, form ideas. Unlike Descartes and Leibniz, who view innate ideas as tendencies or dispositions to form certain thoughts under certain circumstances, Malebranche understands them as fully formed entities that would have to exist somehow in the mind were they to exist there innately. Given this conception, Malebranche finds it unlikely that God would have created “so many things along with the mind of man” (The Search After Truth, p. 227). Since God already contains the ideas of all things within Himself, Malebranche thinks that it would be much more economical if God were simply to reveal to us the ideas of things that already exist in him rather than placing an infinity of ideas in each human mind. Malebranche’s tenet that “we see all things in God” thus follows upon the principle that God always acts in the simplest ways. Malebranche finds further support for this doctrine from the fact that it places human minds in a position of complete dependence on God. Thus, if Malebranche’s rejection of innate ideas distinguishes him from other rationalists, it does so not from an empiricist standpoint, but rather because of the extent to which his position on ideas is theologically motivated.

3. Mathematical Method

In one sense, what it means to be a rationalist is to model philosophy on mathematics, and, in particular, geometry. This means that the rationalist begins with definitions and intuitively self-evident axioms and proceeds thence to deduce a philosophical system of knowledge that is both certain and complete. This at least is the goal and (with some qualifications to be explored below) the claim. In no work of rationalist philosophy is this procedure more apparent than in Spinoza’s Ethics, laid out famously in the geometrical manner (more geometrico). Nevertheless, Descartes’ main works (and those of Leibniz as well), although not as overtly more geometrico as Spinoza’s Ethics, are also modelled after geometry, and it is Descartes’ celebrated methodological program that first introduces mathematics as a model for philosophy.

a. Descartes

Perhaps Descartes’ clearest and most well-known statement of mathematics’ role as paradigm appears in the Discourse on the Method:

Those long chains of very simple and easy reasonings, which geometers customarily use to arrive at their most difficult demonstrations, had given me occasion to suppose that all the things which can fall under human knowledge are interconnected in the same way. (CSM I, 120)

However, Descartes’ promotion of mathematics as a model for philosophy dates back to his early, unfinished work, Rules for the Direction of the Mind. It is in this work that Descartes first outlines his standards for certainty that have since come to be so closely associated with him and with the rationalist enterprise more generally.

In Rule 2, Descartes declares that henceforth only what is certain should be valued and counted as knowledge. This means the rejection of all merely probable reasoning, which Descartes associates with the philosophy of the Schools. Descartes admits that according to this criterion, only arithmetic and geometry thus far count as knowledge. But Descartes does not conclude that only in these disciplines is it possible to attain knowledge. According to Descartes, the reason that certainty has eluded philosophers has as much to do with the disdain that philosophers have for the simplest truths as it does with the subject matter. Admittedly, the objects of arithmetic and geometry are especially pure and simple, or, as Descartes will later say, “clear and distinct.” Nevertheless, certainty can be attained in philosophy as well, provided the right method is followed.

Descartes distinguishes between two ways of achieving knowledge: “through experience and through deduction […] [W]e must note that while our experiences of things are often deceptive, the deduction or pure inference of one thing from another can never be performed wrongly by an intellect which is in the least degree rational […]” (CSM I, 12). This is a clear statement of Descartes’ methodological rationalism. Building up knowledge through accumulated experience can only ever lead to the sort of probable knowledge that Descartes finds lacking. “Pure inference,” by contrast,” can never go astray, at least when it is conducted by right reason. Of course, the truth value of a deductive chain is only as good as the first truths, or axioms, whose truth the deductions preserve. It is for this reason that Descartes’ method relies on intuition as well as deduction. Intuition provides the first principles of a deductive system, for Descartes. Intuition differs from deduction insofar as it is not discursive. Intuition grasps its object in an immediate way. In its broadest outlines, Descartes’ method is just the use of intuition and deduction in the orderly attainment and preservation of certainty.

In subsequent Rules, Descartes goes on to elaborate a more specific methodological program, which involves reducing complicated matters step by step to simpler, intuitively graspable truths, and then using those simple truths as principles from which to deduce knowledge of more complicated matters. It is generally accepted by scholars that this more specific methodological program reappears in a more iconic form in the Discourse on the Method as the four rules for gaining knowledge outlined in Part 2. There is some doubt as to the extent to which this more specific methodological program actually plays any role in Descartes’ mature philosophy as it is expressed in the Meditations and Principles (see Garber 2001, chapter 2). There can be no doubt, however, that the broader methodological guidelines outlined above were a permanent feature of Descartes’ thought.

In response to a request to cast his Meditations in the geometrical style (that is, in the style of Euclid’s Elements), Descartes distinguishes between two aspects of the geometrical style: order and method, explaining:

The order consists simply in this. The items which are put forward first must be known entirely without the aid of what comes later; and the remaining items must be arranged in such a way that their demonstration depends solely on what has gone before. I did try to follow this order very carefully in my Meditations […] (CSM II, 110)

Elsewhere, Descartes contrasts this order, which he calls the “order of reasons,” with another order, which he associates with scholasticism, and which he calls the “order of subject-matter” (see CSMK III, 163). What Descartes understands as “geometrical order” or the “order of reasons” is just the procedure of starting with what is most simple, and proceeding in a step-wise, deliberate fashion to deduce consequences from there. Descartes’ order is governed by what can be clearly and distinctly intuited, and by what can be clearly and distinctly inferred from such self-evident intuitions (rather than by a concern for organizing the discussion into neat topical categories per the order of subject-matter)

As for method, Descartes distinguishes between analysis and synthesis. For Descartes, analysis and synthesis represent different methods of demonstrating a conclusion or set of conclusions. Analysis exhibits the path by which the conclusion comes to be grasped. As such, it can be thought of as the order of discovery or order of knowledge. Synthesis, by contrast, wherein conclusions are deduced from a series of definitions, postulates, and axioms, as in Euclid’s Elements, for instance, follows not the order in which things are discovered, but rather the order that things bear to one another in reality. As such, it can be thought of as the order of being. God, for example, is prior to the human mind in the order of being (since God created the human mind), and so in the synthetic mode of demonstration the existence of God is demonstrated before the existence of the human mind. However, knowledge of one’s own mind precedes knowledge of God, at least in Descartes’ philosophy, and so in the analytic mode of demonstration the cogito is demonstrated before the existence of God. Descartes’ preference is for analysis, because he thinks that it is superior in helping the reader to discover the things for herself, and so in bringing about the intellectual conversion which it is the Meditations’ goal to effectuate in the minds of its readers. According to Descartes, while synthesis, in laying out demonstrations systematically, is useful in preempting dissent, it is inferior in engaging the mind of the reader.

Two primary distinctions can be made in summarizing Descartes’ methodology: (1) the distinction between the order of reasons and the order of subject-matter; and (2) the analysis/synthesis distinction. With respect to the first distinction, the great Continental rationalists are united. All adhere to the order of reasons, as we have described it above, rather than the order of subject-matter. Even though the rationalists disagree about how exactly to interpret the content of the order of reasons, their common commitment to following an order of reasons is a hallmark of their rationalism. Although there are points of convergence with respect to the second, analysis/synthesis distinction, there are also clear points of divergence, and this distinction can be useful in highlighting the range of approaches the rationalists adopt to mathematical methodology.

b. Spinoza

Of the great Continental rationalists, Spinoza is the most closely associated with mathematical method due to the striking presentation of his magnum opus, the Ethics, (as well as his presentation of Descartes’ Principles), in geometrical fashion. The fact that Spinoza is the only major rationalist to present his main work more geometrico might create the impression that he is the only philosopher to employ mathematical method in constructing and elaborating his philosophical system. This impression is mistaken, since both Descartes and Leibniz also apply mathematical method to philosophy. Nevertheless, there are differences between Spinoza’s employment of mathematical method and that of Descartes (and Leibniz). The most striking, of course, is the form of Spinoza’s Ethics. Each part begins with a series of definitions, axioms, and postulates and proceeds thence to deduce propositions, the demonstrations of which refer back to the definitions, axioms, postulates and previously demonstrated propositions on which they depend. Of course, this is just the method of presenting findings that Descartes in the Second Replies dubbed “synthesis.” For Descartes, analysis and synthesis differ only in pedagogical respects: whereas analysis is better for helping the reader discover the truth for herself, synthesis is better in compelling agreement.

There is some evidence that Spinoza’s motivations for employing synthesis were in part pedagogical. In Lodewijk Meyer’s preface to Spinoza’s Principles of Cartesian Philosophy, Meyer uses Descartes’ Second Replies distinction between analysis and synthesis to explain the motivation for the work. Meyer criticizes Descartes’ followers for being too uncritical in their enthusiasm for Descartes’ thought, and attributes this in part to the relative opacity of Descartes’ analytic mode of presentation. Thus, for Meyer, the motivation for presenting Descartes’ Principles in the synthetic manner is to make the proofs more transparent, and thereby leave less excuse for blind acceptance of Descartes’ conclusions. It is not clear to what extent Meyer’s explanation of the mode of presentation of Spinoza’s Principles of Cartesian Philosophy applies to Spinoza’s Ethics. In the first place, although Spinoza approved the preface, he did not author it himself. Secondly, while such an explanation seems especially suited to a work in which Spinoza’s chief goal was to present another philosopher’s thought in a different form, there is no reason to assume that it applies to the presentation of Spinoza’s own philosophy. Scholars have differed on how to interpret the geometrical form of Spinoza’s Ethics. However, it is generally accepted that Spinoza’s use of synthesis does not merely represent a pedagogical preference. There is reason to think that Spinoza’s methodology differs from that of Descartes in a somewhat deeper way.

There is another version of the analysis/synthesis distinction besides Descartes’ that was also influential in the 17th century, that is, Hobbes’ version of the distinction. Although there is little direct evidence that Spinoza was influenced by Hobbes’ version of the distinction, some scholars have claimed a connection, and, in any case, it is useful to view Spinoza’s methodology in light of the Hobbesian alternative.

Synthesis and analysis are not modes of demonstrating findings that have already been made, for Hobbes, as they are for Descartes, but rather complementary means of generating findings; in particular, they are forms of causal reasoning. For Hobbes, analysis is reasoning from effects to causes; synthesis is reasoning in the other direction, from causes to effects. For example, by analysis, we infer that geometrical objects are constructed via the motions of points and lines and surfaces. Once motion has been established as the principle of geometry, it is then possible, via synthesis, to construct the possible effects of motion, and thereby, to make new discoveries in geometry. According to the Hobbesian schema, then, synthesis is not merely a mode of presenting truths, but a means of generating and discovering truths. (For Hobbes’ method, see The English Works of Thomas Hobbes of Malmesbury, vol. 1, ch. 6.) There is reason to think that synthesis had this kind of significance for Spinoza, as well – as a means of discovery, not merely presentation. Spinoza’s methodology, and, in particular, his theory of definitions, bear this out

Spinoza’s method begins with reflection on the nature of a “given true idea.” The “given true idea” serves as a standard by which the mind learns the distinction between true and false ideas, and also between the intellect and the imagination, and how to direct itself properly in the discovery of true ideas. The correct formulation of definitions emerges as the most important factor in directing the mind properly in the discovery of true ideas. To illustrate his conception of a good definition, Spinoza contrasts two definitions of a circle. On one definition, a circle is a figure in which all the lines from the center to the circumference are equal. On another, a circle is the figure described by the rotation of a line around one of its ends, which is fixed. For Spinoza, the second definition is superior. Whereas the first definition gives only a property of the circle, the second provides the cause from which all of the properties can be deduced. Hence, what makes a definition a good definition, for Spinoza, is its capacity to serve as a basis for the discovery of truths about the thing. The circle, of course, is just an example. For Spinoza, the method is perfected when it arrives at a true idea of the first cause of all things, that is, God. Only the method is perfected with a true idea of God, however, not the philosophy. The philosophy itself begins with a true idea of God, since the philosophy consists in deducing the consequences from a true idea of God. With this in mind, the definition of God is of paramount importance. In correspondence, Spinoza compares contrasting definitions of God, explaining that he chose the one which expresses the efficient cause from which all of the properties of God can be deduced.

In this light, it becomes clear that the geometrical presentation of Spinoza’s philosophy is not merely a pedagogic preference. The definitions that appear at the outset of the five parts of the Ethics do not serve merely to make explicit what might otherwise have remained only implicit in Descartes’ analytic mode of presentation. Rather, key definitions, such as the definition of God, are principles that underwrite the development of the system. As a result, Hobbes’ conception of the analysis/synthesis distinction throws an important light on Spinoza’s procedure. There is a movement of analysis in arriving at the causal definition of God from the preliminary “given true idea.” Then there is a movement of synthesis in deducing consequences from that causal definition. Of course, Descartes’ analysis/synthesis distinction still applies, since, after all, Spinoza’s system is presented in the synthetic manner in the Ethics. But the geometrical style of presentation is not merely a pedagogical device in Spinoza’s case. It is also a clue to the nature of his system.

c. Leibniz

Leibniz is openly critical of Descartes’ distinction between analysis and synthesis, writing, “Those who think that the analytic presentation consists in revealing the origin of a discovery, the synthetic in keeping it concealed, are in error” (L, 233). This comment is aimed at Descartes’ formulation of the distinction in the Second Replies. Leibniz is explicit about his adherence to the viewpoint that seems to be implied by Spinoza’s methodology: synthesis is itself a means of discovering truth no less than analysis, not merely a mode of presentation. Leibniz’s understanding of analysis and synthesis is closer to the Hobbesian conception, which views analysis and synthesis as different directions of causal reasoning: from effects to causes (analysis) and from causes to effects (synthesis). Leibniz formulates the distinction in his own terms as follows:

Synthesis is achieved when we begin from principles and run through truths in good order, thus discovering certain progressions and setting up tables, or sometimes general formulas, in which the answers to emerging questions can later be discovered. Analysis goes back to the principles in order to solve the given problems only […] (L, 232)

Leibniz thus conceives synthesis and analysis in relation to principles.

Leibniz lays great stress on the importance of establishing the possibility of ideas, that is to say, establishing that ideas do not involve contradiction, and this applies a fortiori to first principles. For Leibniz, the Cartesian criterion of clear and distinct perception does not suffice for establishing the possibility of an idea. Leibniz is critical, in particular, of Descartes’ ontological argument on the grounds that Descartes neglects to demonstrate the possibility of the idea of a most perfect being on which the argument depends. It is possible to mistakenly assume that an idea is possible, when in reality it is contradictory. Leibniz gives the example of a wheel turning at the fastest possible rate. It might at first seem that this idea is legitimate, but if a spoke of the wheel were extended beyond the rim, the end of the spoke would move faster than a nail in the rim itself, revealing a contradiction in the original notion.

For Leibniz, there are two ways of establishing the possibility of an idea: by experience (a posteriori) and by reducing concepts via analysis down to a relation of identity (a priori). Leibniz credits mathematicians and geometers with pushing the practice of demonstrating what would otherwise normally be taken for granted the furthest. For example, in Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas, Leibniz writes, “That brilliant genius Pascal agrees entirely with these principles when he says, in his famous dissertation on the geometrical spirit […] that it is the task of the geometer to define all terms though ever so little obscure and to prove all truths though little doubtful” (L, 294). Leibniz credits his own doctrine of the possibility of ideas with clarifying exactly what it means for something to be beyond doubt and obscurity.

Leibniz describes the result of the reduction of concepts to identity variously as follows: when the thing is resolved into simple primitive notions understood in themselves (L, 231); “when every ingredient that enters into a distinct concept is itself known distinctly”; “when analysis is carried through to the end” (L, 292). Since, for Leibniz, all true ideas can be reduced to simple identities, it is, in principle, possible to derive all truths via a movement of synthesis from such simple identities in the way that mathematicians produce systems of knowledge on the basis of their basic definitions and axioms. This kind of a priori knowledge of the world is restricted to God, however. According to Leibniz, it is only possible for our finite minds to have this kind of knowledge – which Leibniz calls “intuitive” or “adequate” – in the case of things which do not depend on experience, or what Leibniz also calls “truths of reason,” which include abstract logical and metaphysical truths, and mathematical propositions. In the case of “truths of fact,” by contrast, with the exception of immediately graspable facts of experience, such as, “I think,” and “Various things are thought by me,” we are restricted to formulating hypotheses to explain the phenomena of sensory experience, and such knowledge of the world can, for us, only ever achieve the status of hypothesis, though our hypothetical knowledge can be continually improved and refined. (See Section 5, c, below for a discussion of hypotheses in Leibniz.)

Leibniz is in line with his rationalist predecessors in emphasizing the importance of proper order in philosophizing. Leibniz’s emphasis on establishing the possibility of ideas prior to using them in demonstrating propositions could be understood as a refinement of the geometrical order that Descartes established over against the order of subject-matter. Leibniz emphasizes order in another connection vis-à-vis Locke. As Leibniz makes clear in his New Essays, one of the clearest points of disagreement between him and Locke is on the question of innate ideas. In preliminary comments that Leibniz drew up upon first reading Locke’s Essay, and which he sent to Locke via Burnett, Leibniz makes the following point regarding philosophical order:

Concerning the question whether there are ideas and truths born with us, I do not find it absolutely necessary for the beginnings, nor for the practice of the art of thinking, to answer it; whether they all come to us from outside, or they come from within us, we will reason correctly provided that we keep in mind what I said above, and that we proceed with order and without prejudice. The question of the origin of our ideas and of our maxims is not preliminary in philosophy, and it is necessary to have made great progress in order to resolve it. (Philosophische Schriften, vol. 5, pp. 15-16)

Leibniz’s allusion to what he “said above” refers to remarks regarding the establishment of the possibility of ideas via experience and the principle of identity. This passage makes it clear that, from Leibniz’s point of view, the order in which Locke philosophizes is quite misguided, since Locke begins with a question that should only be addressed after “great progress” has already been made, particularly with respect to the criteria for distinguishing between true and false ideas, and for establishing legitimate philosophical principles. Empiricists generally put much less emphasis on the order of philosophizing, since they do not aim to reason from first principles grasped a priori.

4. A Priori Principles

A fundamental tenet of rationalism – perhaps the fundamental tenet – is that the world is intelligible. The intelligibility tenet means that everything that happens in the world happens in an orderly, lawful, rational manner, and that the mind, in principle, if not always in practice, is able to reproduce the interconnections of things in thought provided that it adheres to certain rules of right reasoning. The intelligibility of the world is sometimes couched in terms of a denial of brute facts, where a “brute fact” is something that “just is the case,” that is, something that obtains without any reason or explanation (even in principle). Many of the a priori principles associated with rationalism can be understood either as versions or implications of the principle of intelligibility. As such, the principle of intelligibility functions as a basic principle of rationalism. It appears under various guises in the great rationalist systems and is used to generate contrasting philosophical systems. Indeed, one of the chief criticisms of rationalism is the fact that its principles can consistently be used to generate contradictory conclusions and systems of thought. The clearest and best known statement of the intelligibility of the world is Leibniz’s principle of sufficient reason. Some scholars have recently emphasized this principle as the key to understanding rationalism (see Della Rocca 2008, chapter 1).

The intelligibility principle raises some classic philosophical problems. Chief among these is a problem of question-begging or circularity. The task of proving that the world is intelligible seems to have to rely on some of the very principles of reasoning in question. In the 17th century, discussion of this fundamental problem centered around the so-called “Cartesian circle.” The problem is still debated by scholars of 17th century thought today. The viability of the rationalist enterprise seems to depend, at least in part, on a satisfactory answer to this problem.

a. Intelligibility and the Cartesian Circle

The most important rational principle in Descartes’ philosophy, the principle which does a great deal of the work in generating its details, is the principle according to which whatever is clearly and distinctly perceived to be true is true. This principle means that if we can form any clear and distinct ideas, then we will be able to trust that they accurately represent their objects, and give us certain knowledge of reality. Descartes’ clear and distinct ideas doctrine is central to his conception of the world’s intelligibility, and indeed, it is central to the rationalists’ conception of the world’s intelligibility more broadly. Although Spinoza and Leibniz both work to refine understanding of what it is to have clear and distinct ideas, they both subscribe to the view that the mind, when directed properly, is able to accurately represent certain basic features of reality, such as the nature of substance.

For Descartes, it cannot be taken for granted from the outset that what we clearly and distinctly perceive to be true is in fact true. It is possible to entertain the doubt that an all-powerful deceiving being fashioned the mind so that it is deceived even in those things it perceives clearly and distinctly. Nevertheless, it is only possible to entertain this doubt when we are not having clear and distinct perceptions. When we are perceiving things clearly and distinctly, their truth is undeniable. Moreover, we can use our capacity for clear and distinct perceptions to demonstrate that the mind was not fashioned by an all-powerful deceiving being, but rather by an all-powerful benevolent being who would not fashion us so as to be deceived even when using our minds properly. Having proved the existence of an all-powerful benevolent being qua creator of our minds, we can no longer entertain any doubts regarding our clear and distinct ideas even when we are not presently engaged in clear and distinct perceptions.

Descartes’ legitimation of clear and distinct perception via his proof of a benevolent God raises notorious interpretive challenges. Scholars disagree about how to resolve the problem of the “Cartesian circle.” However, there is general consensus that Descartes’ procedure is not, in fact, guilty of vicious, logical circularity. In order for Descartes’ procedure to avoid circularity, it is generally agreed that in some sense clear and distinct ideas need already to be legitimate before the proof of God’s existence. It is only in another sense that God’s existence legitimates their truth. Scholars disagree on how exactly to understand those different senses, but they generally agree that there is some sense at least in which clear and distinct ideas are self-legitimating, or, otherwise, not in need of legitimation.

That some ideas provide a basic standard of truth is a fundamental tenet of rationalism, and undergirds all the other rationalist principles at work in the construction of rationalist systems of philosophy. For the rationalists, if it cannot be taken for granted in at least some sense from the outset that the mind is capable of discerning the difference between truth and falsehood, then one never gets beyond skepticism.

b. Substance Metaphysics

The Continental rationalists deploy the principle of intelligibility and subordinate rational principles derived from it in generating much of the content of their respective philosophical systems. In no aspect of their systems is the application of rational principles to the generation of philosophical content more evident and more clearly illustrative of contrasting interpretations of these principles than in that for which the Continental rationalists are arguably best known: substance metaphysics.

i. Descartes

Descartes deploys his clear and distinct ideas doctrine in justifying his most well-known metaphysical position: substance dualism. The first step in Descartes’ demonstration of mind-body dualism, or, in his terminology, of a “real” distinction (that is, a distinction between two substances) between mind and body is to show that while it is possible to doubt that one has a body, it is not possible to doubt that one is thinking. As Descartes makes clear in the Principles of Philosophy, one of the chief upshots of his famous cogito argument is the discovery of the distinction between a thinking thing and a corporeal thing. The impossibility of doubting one’s existence is not the impossibility of doubting that one is a human being with a body with arms and legs and a head. It is the impossibility of doubting, rather, that one doubts, perceives, dreams, imagines, understands, wills, denies, and other modalities that Descartes attributes to the thinking thing. It is possible to think of oneself as a thing that thinks, and to recognize that it is impossible to doubt that one thinks, while continuing to doubt that one has a body with arms and legs and a head. So, the cogito drives a preliminary wedge between mind and body.

At this stage of the argument, however, Descartes has simply established that it is possible to conceive of himself as a thinking thing without conceiving of himself as a corporeal thing. It remains possible that, in fact, the thinking thing is identical with a corporeal thing, in other words, that thought is somehow something a body can do; Descartes has yet to establish that the epistemological distinction between his knowledge of his mind and his knowledge of body that results from the hyperbolic doubt translates to a metaphysical or ontological distinction between mind and body. The move from the epistemological distinction to the ontological distinction proceeds via the doctrine of clear and distinct ideas. Having established that whatever he clearly and distinctly perceives is true, Descartes is in a position to affirm the real distinction between mind and body.

In this life, it is never possible to clearly and distinctly perceive a mind actually separate from a body, at least in the case of finite, created minds, because minds and bodies are intimately unified in the composite human being. So Descartes cannot base his proof for the real distinction of mind and body on the clear and distinct perception that mind and body are in fact independently existing things. Rather, Descartes’ argument is based on the joint claims that (1) it is possible to have a clear and distinct idea of thought apart from extension and vice versa; and (2) whatever we can clearly and distinctly understand is capable of being created by God exactly as we clearly and distinctly understand it. Thus, the fact that we can clearly and distinctly understand thought apart from extension and vice versa entails that thinking things and extended things are “really” distinct (in the sense that they are distinct substances separable by God).

The foregoing argument relies on certain background assumptions which it is now necessary to explain, in particular, Descartes’ conception of substance. In the Principles, Descartes defines substance as “a thing which exists in such a way as to depend on no other thing for its existence” (CSM I, 210). Properly speaking, only God can be understood to depend on no other thing, and so only God is a substance in the absolute sense. Nevertheless, Descartes allows that, in a relative sense, created things can count as substances too. A created thing is a substance if the only thing it relies upon for its existence is “the ordinary concurrence of God” (ibid.). Only mind and body qualify as substances in this secondary sense. Everything else is a modification or property of minds and bodies. A second point is that, for Descartes, we do not have a direct knowledge of substance; rather, we come to know substance by virtue of its attributes. Thought and extension are the attributes or properties in virtue of which we come to know thinking and corporeal substance, or “mind” and “body.” This point relies on the application of a key rational principle, to wit, nothingness has no properties. For Descartes, there cannot simply be the properties of thinking and extension without these properties having something in which to inhere. Thinking and extension are not just any properties; Descartes calls them “principal attributes” because they constitute the nature of their respective substances. Other, non-essential properties, cannot be understood without the principal attribute, but the principal attribute can be understood without any of the non-essential properties. For example, motion cannot be understood without extension, but extension can be understood without motion.

Descartes’ conception of mind and body as distinct substances includes some interesting corollaries which result from a characteristic application of rational principles and account for some characteristic doctrinal differences between Descartes and empiricist philosophers. One consequence of Descartes’ conception of the mind as a substance whose principal attribute is thought is that the mind must always be thinking. Since, for Descartes, thinking is something of which the thinker is necessarily aware, Descartes’ commitment to thought as an essential, and therefore, inseparable, property of the mind raises some awkward difficulties. Arnauld, for example, raises one such difficulty in his Objections to Descartes’ Meditations: presumably there is much going on in the mind of an infant in its mother’s womb of which the infant is not aware. In response to this objection, and also in response to another obvious problem, that is, that of dreamless sleep, Descartes insists on a distinction between being aware of or conscious of our thoughts at the time we are thinking them, and remembering them afterwards (CSMK III, 357). The infant is, in fact, aware of its thinking in the mother’s womb, but it is aware only of very confused sensory thoughts of pain and pleasure and heat (not, as Descartes points out, metaphysical matters (CSMK III, 189)) which it does not remember afterwards. Similarly, the mind is always thinking even in the most “dreamless sleep,” it is just that the mind often immediately forgets much of what it had been aware.

Descartes’ commitment to embracing the implications – however counter-intuitive – of his substance-attribute metaphysics, puts him at odds with, for instance, Locke, who mocks the Cartesian doctrine of the always-thinking soul in his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. For Locke, the question whether the soul is always thinking or not must be decided by experience and not, as Locke says, merely by “hypothesis” (An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Book II, Chapter 1). The evidence of dreamless sleep makes it obvious, for Locke, that the soul is not always thinking. Because Locke ties personal identity to memory, if the soul were to think while asleep without knowing it, the sleeping man and the waking man would be two different persons.

Descartes’ commitment to the always-thinking mind is a consequence of his commitment to a more basic rational principle. In establishing his conception of thinking substance, Descartes reasons from the attribute of thinking to the substance of thinking on the grounds that nothing has no properties. In this case, he reasons in the other direction, from the substance of thinking, that is, the mind, to the property of thinking on the converse grounds that something must have properties, and the properties it must have are the properties that make it what it is; in the case of the mind, that property is thought. (Leibniz found a way to maintain the integrity of the rational principle without contradicting experience: admit that thinking need not be conscious. This way the mind can still think in a dreamless sleep, and so avoid being without any properties, without any problem about the recollection of awareness.)

Another consequence of Descartes’ substance metaphysics concerns corporeal substance. For Descartes, we do not know corporeal substance directly, but rather through a grasp of its principal attribute, extension. Extension qua property requires a substance in which to inhere because of the rational principle, nothing has no properties. This rational principle leads to another characteristic Cartesian position regarding the material world: the denial of a vacuum. Descartes denies that space can be empty or void. Space has the property of being extended in length, breadth, and depth, and such properties require a substance in which to inhere. Thus, nothing, that is, a void or vacuum, is not able to have such properties because of the rational principle, nothing has no properties. This means that all space is filled with substance, even if it is imperceptible. Once again, Descartes answers a debated philosophical question on the basis of a rational principle.

ii. Spinoza

If Descartes is known for his dualism, Spinoza, of course, is known for monism – the doctrine that there is only one substance. Spinoza’s argument for substance monism (laid out in the first fifteen propositions of the Ethics) has no essential basis in sensory experience; it proceeds through rational argumentation and the deployment of rational principles; although Spinoza provides one a posteriori argument for God’s existence, he makes clear that he presents it only because it is easier to grasp than the a priori arguments, and not because it is in any way necessary.

The crucial step in the argument for substance monism comes in Ethics 1p5: “In Nature there cannot be two or more substances of the same nature or attribute.” It is at this proposition that Descartes (and Leibniz, and many others) would part ways with Spinoza. The most striking and controversial implication of this proposition, at least from a Cartesian perspective, is that human minds cannot qualify as substances, since human minds all share the same nature or attribute, that is, thought. In Spinoza’s philosophy, human minds are actually themselves properties – Spinoza calls them “modes” – of a more basic, infinite substance.

The argument for 1p5 works as follows. If there were two or more distinct substances, there would have to be some way to distinguish between them. There are two possible distinctions to be made: either by a difference in their affections or by a difference in their attributes. For Spinoza, a substance is something which exists in itself and can be conceived through itself; an attribute is “what the intellect perceives of a substance, as constituting its essence” (Ethics 1d4). Spinoza’s conception of attributes is a matter of longstanding scholarly debate, but for present purposes, we can think of it along Cartesian lines. For Descartes, substance is always grasped through a principal property, which is the nature or essence of the substance. Spinoza agrees that an attribute is that through which the mind conceives the nature or essence of substance. With this in mind, if a distinction between two substances were to be made on the basis of a difference in attributes, then there would not be two substances of the same attribute as the proposition indicates. This means that if there were two substances of the same attribute, it would be necessary to distinguish between them on the basis of a difference in modes or affections.

Spinoza conceives of an affection or mode as something which exists in another and needs to be conceived through another. Given this conception of affections, it is impossible, for Spinoza, to distinguish between two substances on the basis of a difference in affections. Doing so would be somewhat akin to affirming that there are two apples on the basis of a difference between two colors, when one apple can quite possibly have a red part and a green part. As color differences do not per se determine differences between apples, in a similar way, modal differences cannot determine a difference between substances – you could just be dealing with one substance bearing multiple different affections. It is notable that in 1p5, Spinoza uses virtually the same substance-attribute schema as Descartes to deny a fundamental feature of Descartes’ system.

Having established 1p5, the next major step in Spinoza’s argument for substance monism is to establish the necessary existence and infinity of substance. For Spinoza, if things have nothing in common with each other, one cannot be the cause of the other. This thesis depends upon assumptions that lie at the heart of Spinoza’s rationalism. Something that has nothing in common with another thing cannot be the cause of the other thing because things that have nothing in common with one another cannot be understood through one another (Ethics 1a5). But, for Spinoza, effects should be able to be understood through causes. Indeed, what it is to understand something, for Spinoza, is to understand its cause. The order of knowledge, provided that the knowledge is genuine, or, as Spinoza says, “adequate,” must map onto the order of being, and vice versa. Thus, Spinoza’s claim that if things have nothing in common with one another, one cannot be the cause of the other, is an expression of Spinoza’s fundamental, rationalist commitment to the intelligibility of the world. Given this assumption, and given the fact that no two substances have anything in common with one another, since no two substances share the same nature or attribute, it follows that if a substance is to exist, it must exist as causa sui (self-caused); in other words, it must pertain to the essence of substance to exist. Moreover, Spinoza thinks that since there is nothing that has anything in common with a given substance, there is therefore nothing to limit the nature of a given substance, and so every substance will necessarily be infinite. This assertion depends on another deep-seated assumption of Spinoza’s philosophy: nothing limits itself, but everything by virtue of its very nature affirms its own nature and existence as much as possible.

At this stage, Spinoza has argued that substances of a single attribute exist necessarily and are necessarily infinite. The last major stage of the argument for substance monism is the transition from multiple substances of a single attribute to only one substance of infinite attributes. Scholars have expressed varying degrees of satisfaction with the lucidity of this transition. It seems to work as follows. It is possible to attribute many attributes to one substance. The more reality or being each thing has, the more attributes belong to it. Therefore, an absolutely infinite being is a being that consists of infinite attributes. Spinoza calls an absolutely infinite being or substance consisting of infinite attributes “God.” Spinoza gives four distinct arguments for God’s existence in Ethics 1p11. The first is commonly interpreted as Spinoza’s version of an ontological argument. It refers back to 1p7 where Spinoza proved that it pertains to the essence of substance to exist. The second argument is relevant to present purposes, since it turns on Spinoza’s version of the principle of sufficient reason: “For each thing there must be assigned a cause, or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence” (Ethics 1p11dem). But there can be no reason for God’s nonexistence for the same reasons that all substances are necessarily infinite: there is nothing outside of God that is able to limit Him, and nothing limits itself. Once again, Spinoza’s argument rests upon his assumption that things by nature affirm their own existence. The third argument is a posteriori, and the fourth pivots like the second on the assumption that things by nature affirm their own existence.

Having proven that a being consisting of infinite attributes exists, Spinoza’s argument for substance monism is nearly complete. It remains only to point out that no substance besides God can exist, because if it did, it would have to share at least one of God’s infinite attributes, which, by 1p5, is impossible. Everything that exists, then, is either an attribute or an affection of God.

iii. Leibniz

Leibniz’s universe consists of an infinity of monads or simple substances, and God. For Leibniz, the universe must be composed of monads or simple substances. His justification for this claim is relatively straightforward. There must be simples, because there are compounds, and compounds are just collections of simples. To be simple, for Leibniz, means to be without parts, and thus to be indivisible. For Leibniz, the simples or monads are the “true atoms of nature” (L, 643). However, “material atoms are contrary to reason” (L, 456). Manifold a priori considerations lead Leibniz to reject material atoms. In the first place, the notion of a material atom is contradictory in Leibniz’s view. Matter is extended, and that which is extended is divisible into parts. The very notion of an atom, however, is the notion of something indivisible, lacking parts.

From a different perspective, Leibniz’s dynamical investigations provide another argument against material atoms. Absolute rigidity is included in the notion of a material atom, since any elasticity in the atom could only be accounted for on the basis of parts within the atom shifting their position with respect to each other, which is contrary to the notion of a partless atom. According to Leibniz’s analysis of impact, however, absolute rigidity is shown not to make sense. Consider the rebound of one atom as a result of its collision with another. If the atoms were absolutely rigid, the change in motion resulting from the collision would have to happen instantaneously, or, as Leibniz says, “through a leap or in a moment” (L, 446). The atom would change from initial motion to rest to rebounded motion without passing through any intermediary degrees of motion. Since the body must pass through all the intermediary degrees of motion in transitioning from one state of motion to another, it must not be absolutely rigid, but rather elastic; the analysis of the parts of the body must, in correlation with the degree of motion, proceed to infinity. Leibniz’s dynamical argument against material atoms turns on what he calls the law of continuity, an a priori principle according to which “no change occurs through a leap.”

The true unities, or true atoms of nature, therefore, cannot be material; they must be spiritual or metaphysical substances akin to souls. Since Leibniz’s spiritual substances, or monads, are absolutely simple, without parts, they admit neither of dissolution nor composition. Moreover, there can be no interaction between monads, monads cannot receive impressions or undergo alterations by means of being affected from the outside, since, in Leibniz’s famous phrase from the Monadology, monads “have no windows” (L, 643). Monads must, however, have qualities, otherwise there would be no way to explain the changes we see in things and the diversity of nature. Indeed, following from Leibniz’s principle of the identity of indiscernibles, no two monads can be exactly alike, since each monad stands in a unique relation to the rest, and, for Leibniz, each monad’s relation to the rest is a distinctive feature of its nature. The way in which, for Leibniz, monads can have qualities while remaining simple, or in other words, the only way there can be multitude in simplicity is if monads are characterized and distinguished by means of their perceptions. Leibniz’s universe, in summary, consists in monads, simple spiritual substances, characterized and distinguished from one another by a unique series of perceptions determined by each monad’s unique relationship vis-à-vis the others.

Of the great rationalists, Leibniz is the most explicit about the principles of reasoning that govern his thought. Leibniz singles out two, in particular, as the most fundamental rational principles of his philosophy: the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason. According to the principle of contradiction, whatever involves a contradiction is false. According to the principle of sufficient reason, there is no fact or true proposition “without there being a sufficient reason for its being so and not otherwise” (L, 646). Corresponding to these two principles of reasoning are two kinds of truths: truths of reasoning and truths of fact. For Leibniz, truths of reasoning are necessary, and their opposite is impossible. Truths of fact, by contrast, are contingent, and their opposite is possible. Truths of reasoning are by most commentators associated with the principle of contradiction because they can be reduced via analysis to a relation between two primitive ideas, whose identity is intuitively evident. Thus, it is possible to grasp why it is impossible for truths of reasoning to be otherwise. However, this kind of resolution is only possible in the case of abstract propositions, such as the propositions of mathematics (see Section 3, c, above). Contingent truths, or truths of fact, by contrast, such as “Caesar crossed the Rubicon,” to use the example Leibniz gives in the Discourse on Metaphysics, are infinitely complicated. Although, for Leibniz, every predicate is contained in its subject, to reduce the relationship between Caesar’s “notion” and his action of crossing the Rubicon would require an infinite analysis impossible for finite minds. “Caesar crossed the Rubicon” is a contingent proposition, because there is another possible world in which Caesar did not cross the Rubicon. To understand the reason for Caesar’s crossing, then, entails understanding why this world exists rather than any other possible world. It is for this reason that contingent truths are associated with the principle of sufficient reason. Although the opposite of truths of fact is possible, there is nevertheless a sufficient reason why the fact is so and not otherwise, even though this reason cannot be known by finite minds.

Truths of fact, then, need to be explained; there must be a sufficient reason for them. However, according to Leibniz, “a sufficient reason for existence cannot be found merely in any one individual thing or even in the whole aggregate and series of things” (L, 486). That is to say, the sufficient reason for any given contingent fact cannot be found within the world of which it is a part. The sufficient reason must explain why this world exists rather than another possible world, and this reason must lie outside the world itself. For Leibniz, the ultimate reason for things must be contained in a necessary substance that creates the world, that is, God. But if the existence of God is to ground the series of contingent facts that make up the world, there must be a sufficient reason why God created this world rather than any of the other infinite possible worlds contained in his understanding. As a perfect being, God would only have chosen to bring this world into existence rather than any other because it is the best of all possible worlds. God’s choice, therefore, is governed by the principle of fitness, or what Leibniz also calls the “principle of the best” (L, 647). The best world, according to Leibniz, is the one which maximizes perfection; and the most perfect world is the one which balances the greatest possible variety with the greatest possible order. God achieves maximal perfection in the world through what Leibniz calls “the pre-established harmony.” Although the world is made up of an infinity of monads with no direct interaction with one another, God harmonizes the perceptions of each monad with the perceptions of every other monad, such that each monad represents a unique perspective on the rest of the universe according to its position vis-à-vis the others.

According to Leibniz’s philosophy, in the case of all true propositions, the predicate is contained in the subject. This is often known as the “predicate-in-notion principle. The relationship between predicate and subject can only be reduced to an identity relation in the case of truths of reason, whereas in the case of truths of fact, the reduction requires an infinite analysis. Nevertheless, in both cases, it is possible in principle (which is to say, for an infinite intellect) to know everything that will ever happen to an individual substance, and even everything that will happen in the world of an individual substance on the basis of an examination of the individual substance’s notion, since each substance is an expression of the entire world. Leibniz’s predicate-in-notion principle therefore unifies both of his two great principles of reasoning – the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason – since the relation between predicate and subject is either such that it is impossible for it to be otherwise or such that there is a sufficient reason why it is as it is and not otherwise. Moreover, it represents a particularly robust expression of the principle of intelligibility at the very heart of Leibniz’s system. There is a reason why everything is as it is, whether that reason is subject to finite or only to infinite analysis.

(See also: 17th Century Theories of Substance.)

5. Continental Rationalism, Experience, and Experiment

Rationalism is often criticized for placing too much confidence in the ability of reason alone to know the world. The extent to which one finds this criticism justified depends largely on one’s view of reason. For Hume, for instance, knowledge of the world of “matters of fact” is gained exclusively through experience; reason is merely a faculty for comparing ideas gained through experience; it is thus parasitic upon experience, and has no claim whatsoever to grasp anything about the world itself, let alone any special claim. For Kant, reason is a mental faculty with an inherent tendency to transgress the bounds of possible experience in an effort to grasp the metaphysical foundations of the phenomenal realm. Since knowledge of the world is limited to objects of possible experience, for Kant, reason, with its delusions of grasping reality beyond those limits, must be subject to critique.

Sometimes rationalism is charged with neglecting or undervaluing experience, and with embarrassingly having no means of accounting for the tremendous success of the experimental sciences. While the criticism of the confidence placed in reason may be defensible given a certain conception of reason (which may or may not itself be ultimately defensible), the latter charge of neglecting experience is not; more often than not it is the product of a false caricature of rationalism

Descartes and Leibniz were the leading mathematicians of their day, and stood at the forefront of science. While Spinoza distinguished himself more as a political thinker, and as an interpreter of scripture (albeit a notorious one) than as a mathematician, Spinoza too performed experiments, kept abreast of the leading science of the day, and was renowned as an expert craftsman of lenses. Far from neglecting experience, the great rationalists had, in general, a sophisticated understanding of the role of experience and, indeed, of experiment, in the acquisition and development of knowledge. The fact that the rationalists held that experience and experiment cannot serve as foundations for knowledge, but must be fitted within, and interpreted in light of, a rational epistemic framework, should not be confused with a neglect of experience and experiment.

a. Descartes

One of the stated purposes of Descartes’ Meditations, and, in particular, the hyperbolic doubts with which it commences, is to reveal to the mind of the reader the limitations of its reliance on the senses, which Descartes regards as an inadequate foundation for knowledge. By leading the mind away from the senses, which often deceive, and which yield only confused ideas, Descartes prepares the reader to discover the clear and distinct perceptions of the pure intellect, which provide a proper foundation for genuine knowledge. Nevertheless, empirical observations and experimentation clearly had an important role to play in Descartes’ natural philosophy, as evidenced by his own private empirical and experimental research, especially in optics and anatomy, and by his explicit statements in several writings on the role and importance of observation and experiment.

In Part 6 of the Discourse on the Method, Descartes makes an open plea for assistance – both financial and otherwise – in making systematic empirical observations and conducting experiments. Also in Discourse Part 6, Descartes lays out his program for developing knowledge of nature. It begins with the discovery of “certain seeds of truth” implanted naturally in our souls (CSM I, 144). From them, Descartes seeks to derive the first principles and causes of everything. Descartes’ Meditations illustrates these first stages of the program. By “seeds of truth” Descartes has in mind certain intuitions, including the ideas of thinking, and extension, and, in particular, of God. On the basis of clearly and distinctly perceiving the distinction between what belongs properly to extension (figure, position, motion) and what does not (colors, sounds, smells, and so forth), Descartes discovers the principles of physics, including the laws of motion. From these principles, it is possible to deduce many particular ways in which the details of the world might be, only a small fraction of which represent the way the world actually is. It is as a result of the distance, as it were, between physical principles and laws of nature, on one hand, and the particular details of the world, on the other, that, for Descartes, observations and experiments become necessary.

Descartes is ambivalent about the relationship between physical principles and particulars, and about the role that observation and experiment play in mediating this relationship. On the one hand, Descartes expresses commitment to the ideal of a science deduced with certainty from intuitively grasped first principles. Because of the great variety of mutually incompatible consequences that can be derived from physical principles, observation and experiment are required even in the ideal deductive science to discriminate between actual consequences and merely possible ones. According to the ideal of deductive science, however, observation and experiment should be used only to facilitate the deduction of effects from first causes, and not as a basis for an inference to possible explanations of natural phenomena, as Descartes makes clear at one point his Principles of Philosophy (CSM I, 249). If the explanations were only possible, or hypothetical, the science could not lay claim to certainty per the deductive ideal, but merely to probability.

On the other hand, Descartes states explicitly at another point in the Principles of Philosophy that the explanations provided of such phenomena as the motion of celestial bodies and the nature of the earth’s elements should be regarded merely as hypotheses arrived at on the basis of a posteriori reasoning (CSM I, 255); while Descartes says that such hypotheses must agree with observation and facilitate predictions, they need not in fact reflect the actual causes of phenomena. Descartes appears to concede, albeit reluctantly, that when it comes to explaining particular phenomena, hypothetical explanations and moral certainty (that is, mere probability) are all that can be hoped for.

Scholars have offered a range of explanations for the inconsistency in Descartes’ writings on the question of the relation between first principles and particulars. It has been suggested that the inconsistency within the Principles of Philosophy reflects different stages of its composition (see Garber 1978). However the inconsistency might be explained, it is clear that Descartes did not take it for granted that the ideal of a deductive science of nature could be realized. Moreover, whether or not Descartes ultimately believed the ideal of deductive science was realizable, he was unambiguous on the importance of observation and experiment in bridging the distance between physical principles and particular phenomena. (For further discussion, see René Descartes: Scientific Method.)

b. Spinoza

The one work that Spinoza published under his own name in his lifetime was his geometrical reworking of Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy. In Spinoza’s presentation of the opening sections of Part 3 of Descartes’ Principles, Spinoza puts a strong emphasis on the hypothetical nature of the explanations of natural phenomena in Part 3. Given the hesitance and ambivalence with which Descartes concedes the hypothetical nature of his explanations in his Principles, Spinoza’s unequivocal insistence on hypotheses is striking. Elsewhere Spinoza endorses hypotheses more directly. In the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza describes forming the concept of a sphere by affirming the rotation of a semicircle in thought. He points out that this idea is a true idea of a sphere even if no sphere has ever been produced this way in nature (The Collected Works of Spinoza, Vol. 1, p. 32). Spinoza’s view of hypotheses relates to his conception of good definitions (see Section 3, b, above). If the cause through which one conceives something allows for the deduction of all possible effects, then the cause is an adequate one, and there is no need to fear a false hypothesis. Spinoza appears to differ from Descartes in thinking that the formation of hypotheses, if done properly, is consistent with deductive certainty, and not tantamount to mere probability or moral certainty.

Again in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza speaks in Baconian fashion of identifying “aids” that can assist in the use of the senses and in conducting orderly experiments. Unfortunately, Spinoza’s comments regarding “aids” are very unclear. This is perhaps explained by the fact that they appear in a work that Spinoza never finished. Nevertheless, it does seem clear that although Spinoza, like Descartes, emphasized the importance of discovering proper principles from which to deduce knowledge of everything else, he was no less aware than Descartes of the need to proceed via observation and experiment in descending from such principles to particulars. At the same time, given his analysis of the inadequacy of sensory images, the collection of empirical data must be governed by rules and rational guidelines the details of which it does not seem that Spinoza ever worked out.

A valuable perspective on Spinoza’s attitude toward experimentation is provided by Letter 6, which Spinoza wrote to Oldenburg with comments on Robert Boyle’s experimental research. Among other matters, at issue is Boyle’s “redintegration” (or reconstitution) of niter (potassium nitrate). By heating niter with a burning coal, Boyle separated the niter into a “fixed” part and a volatile part; he then proceeded to distill the volatile part, and recombine it with the fixed part, thereby redintegrating the niter. Boyle’s aim was to show that the nature of niter is not determined by a Scholastic “substantial form,” but rather by the composition of parts, whose secondary qualities (color, taste, smell, and so forth) are determined by primary qualities (size, position, motion, and so forth). While taking no issue with Boyle’s attempt to undermine the Scholastic analysis of physical natures, Spinoza criticized Boyle’s interpretation of the experiment, arguing that the fixed niter was merely an impurity left over, and that there was no difference between the niter and the volatile part other than a difference of state.

Two things stand out from Spinoza’s comments on Boyle. On the one hand, Spinoza exhibits a degree of impatience with Boyle’s experiments, charging some of them with superfluity on the grounds either that what they show is evident on the basis of reason alone, or that previous philosophers have already sufficiently demonstrated them experimentally. In addition, Spinoza’s own interpretation of Boyle’s experiment is primarily based in a rather speculative, Cartesian account of the mechanical constitution of niter (as Boyle himself points out in response to Spinoza). On the other hand, Spinoza appears eager to show his own fluency with experimental practice, describing no fewer than three different experiments of his own invention to support his interpretation of the redintegration. What Spinoza is critical of is not so much Boyle’s use of experiment per se as his relative neglect of relevant rational considerations. For instance, Spinoza at one point criticizes Boyle for trying to show that secondary qualities depend on primary qualities on experimental grounds. Spinoza thought the proposition needed to be demonstrated on rational grounds.  While Spinoza acknowledges the importance and necessity of observation and experiment, his emphasis and focus is on the rational framework needed for making sense of experimental findings, without which the results are confused and misleading.

c. Leibniz

In principle, Leibniz thinks it is not impossible to discover the interior constitution of bodies a priori on the basis of a knowledge of God and the “principle of the best” according to which He creates the world. Leibniz sometimes remarks that angels could explain to us the intelligible causes through which all things come about, but he seems conflicted over whether such understanding is actually possible for human beings. Leibniz seems to think that while the a priori pathway should be pursued in this life by the brightest minds in any case, its perfection will only be possible in the afterlife. The obstacle to an a priori conception of things is the complexity of sensible effects. In this life, then, knowledge of nature cannot be purely a priori, but depends on observation and experimentation in conjunction with reason

Apart from perception, we have clear and distinct ideas only of magnitude, figure, motion, and other such quantifiable attributes (primary qualities). The goal of all empirical research must be to resolve phenomena (including secondary qualities) into such distinctly perceived, quantifiable notions. For example, heat is explained in terms of some particular motion of air or some other fluid. Only in this way can the epistemic ideal be achieved of understanding how phenomena follow from their causes in the same way that we know how the hammer stroke after a period of time follows from the workings of a clock (L, 173). To this end, experiments must be carried out to indicate possible relationships between secondary qualities and primary qualities, and to provide a basis for the formulation of hypotheses to explain the phenomena.

Nevertheless, there is an inherent limitation to this procedure. Leibniz explains that if there were people who had no direct experience of heat, for instance, even if someone were to explain to them the precise mechanical cause of heat, they would still not be able to know the sensation of heat, because they would still not distinctly grasp the connection between bodily motion and perception (L, 285). Leibniz seems to think that human beings will never be able to bridge the explanatory gap between sensations and mechanical causes. There will always be an irreducibly confused aspect of sensible ideas, even if they can be associated with a high degree of sophistication with distinctly perceivable, quantifiable notions. However, this limitation does not mean, for Leibniz, that there is any futility in human efforts to understand the world scientifically. In the first place, experimental knowledge of the composition of things is tremendously useful in practice, even if the composition is not distinctly perceived in all its parts. As Leibniz points out, the architect who uses stones to erect a cathedral need not possess a distinct knowledge of the bits of earth interposed between the stones (L, 175). Secondly, even if our understanding of the causes of sensible effects must remain forever hypothetical, the hypotheses themselves can be more or less refined, and it is proper experimentation that assists in their refinement.

6. References and Further Reading

When citing the works of Descartes, the three volume English translation by Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, and Kenny was used. For the original language, the edition by Adam and Tannery was consulted.

When citing Spinoza’s Ethics, the translation by Curley in A Spinoza Reader was used. The following system of abbreviation was used when citing passages from the Ethics: the first number designates the part of the Ethics (1-5); then, “p” is for proposition, “d” for definition, “a” for axiom, “dem” for demonstration, “c” for corollary, and “s” for scholium. So, 1p17s refers to the scholium of the seventeenth proposition of the first part of the Ethics. For the original language, the edition by Gebhardt was consulted.

For the original language in Leibniz, the edition by Gerhardt was consulted.

a. Primary Sources

  • Bacon, Francis. The Works of Francis Bacon. 7 Volumes. Edited by J. Spedding, R. L. Ellis, and D.D. Heath. London: Longmans, 1857-70. Cited above as Spedding, volume, page.
  • Bacon, Francis. The New Organon. Edited by Lisa Jardine and Michael Silverthorne. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Descartes, René. Oeuvres de Descartes. 12 Volumes. Edited by C. Adam and P. Tannery. Paris: J. Vrin, 1964-76.
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. 3 vols. Vols. 1 and 2 translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch. Vol. 3 translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1984-91. Cited above as CSM or CSMK, volume, page.
  • Hegel, G.W.F. Werke in zwanzig BändenVorlesungen über die Geschichte der Philosophie: Werke XX. Edited by Eva Moldenhauer and Karl Markus Michel. Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1986. Cited as Werke, volume, page.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. The English Works of Thomas Hobbes of Malmesbury, Volume 1. London: John Bohn, 1839.
  • Leibniz, G.W. Philosophische Schriften. 7 Volumes. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin, 1875-90.
  • Leibniz, G.W. Philosophical Papers and Letters. Second Edition. Translated and edited by Leroy E. Loemker. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989. Cited above as L, page.
  • Leibniz, G.W. New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated and edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathan Bennett. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1996. Cited above as NE, page.
  • Locke, John. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 1979.
  • Malebranche, Nicholas. The Search after Truth. Translated and edited by Thomas M. Lennon and Paul J. Olscamp. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. Spinoza Opera. 4 Volumes. Edited by C. Gebhardt. Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol. 1. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1985.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. A Spinoza Reader: The Ethics and Other Works. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1994.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. Spinoza: Complete Works. Translated by Samuel Shirley and edited by Michael L. Morgan. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2002.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ayers, Michael (ed.). Rationalism, Platonism and God. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 2007.
  • Biasutti, Franco. “Reason and Experience in Leibniz and Spinoza” in Studia Spinozana, Volume 6, Spinoza and Leibniz (1990): 45-71.
  • Cottingham, John. The Rationalists. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 1988.
  • Della Rocca, Michael. Spinoza. London: Routledge, 2008.
  • Fraenkel, Carlos; Perinetti, Dario; Smith, Justin E.H. (eds.). The Rationalists: Between Tradition and Innovation. Dordrecht: Springer, 2011.
  • Gabbey, Alan. “Spinoza’s natural science and methodology” in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza, edited by Don Garrett. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Garber, Daniel. “Science and Certainty in Descartes” in Descartes: Critical and Interpretive Essays, edited by Michael Hooker. Baltimore, MD: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1978.
  • Garber, Daniel. Descartes Embodied: Reading Cartesian Philosophy through Cartesian Science. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Huenemann, Charlie. Understanding Rationalism. Durham, UK: Acumen Publishing, 2008.
  • Leduc, Christian. “Leibniz and Sensible Qualities” in British Journal for the History of Philosophy. 18(5), 2010: 797-819.
  • Nelson, Alan (ed.). A Companion to Rationalism. Oxford, UK: Blackwell, 2005.
  • Pereboom, Derk (ed.). The Rationalists: Critical Essays on Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz. Rowman & Littlefield, 1999.
  • Phemister, Pauline. The Rationalists: Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz. Polity, 2006.
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Author Information

Matthew Homan
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.

Metaphor and Phenomenology

 The term “contemporary phenomenology” refers to a wide area of 20th and 21st century philosophy in which the study of the structures of consciousness occupies center stage. Since the appearance of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason and subsequent developments in phenomenology and hermeneutics after Husserl, it has no longer been possible to view consciousness as a simple scientific object of study. It is, in fact, the precondition for any sort of meaningful experience, even the simple apprehension of objects in the world. While the basic features of phenomenological consciousness – intentionality, self-awareness, embodiment, and so forth—have been the focus of analysis, Continental philosophers such as Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida go further in adding a linguistically creative dimension. They argue that metaphor and symbol act as the primary interpreters of reality, generating richer layers of perception, expression, and meaning in speculative thought. The interplay of metaphor and phenomenology introduces serious challenges and ambiguities within long-standing assumptions in the history of Western philosophy, largely with respect to the strict divide between the literal and figurative modes of reality based in the correspondence theory of truth. Since the end of the 20th century, the role of metaphor in the production of cognitive structures has been taken up and extended in new productive directions, including “naturalized phenomenology” and straightforward cognitive science, notably in the work of G. Lakoff and M. Johnson, M. Turner, D. Zahavi, and S. Gallagher.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview
    1. The Conventional View: Aristotle’s Contribution to Substitution Model
    2. The Philosophical Issues
    3. Nietzsche’s Role in Development of Phenomenological Theories of Metaphor
  2. The Phenomenological Theory in Continental Philosophy
    1. Phenomenological Method: Husserl
    2. Heidegger’s Contribution
  3. Existential Phenomenology: Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics, and Metaphor
    1. The Mechanics of Conceptual Blending
    2. The Role of Kant’s Schematism in Conceptual Blending
  4. Jacques Derrida: Metaphor as Metaphysics
    1. The Dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida
  5. Anglo-American Philosophy: Interactionist Theories
  6. Metaphor, Phenomenology, and Cognitive Science
    1. The Embodied Mind
    2. The Literary Mind
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Overview

This article highlights the definitive points in the ongoing philosophical conversation about metaphorical language and it’s centrality in phenomenology. The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, at times presented as a critique, is a radical alternative to the conventional analysis of metaphor. The conventional view, largely inherited from Aristotle, is also known as the “substitution model.” In the traditional, or standard approach, the uses and applications of metaphor have been restricted to (along with other related symbolic phenomena/tropes) the realms of rhetoric and poetics. In this view, metaphor is none other than a kind of categorical mistake, a deviance of sense produced in order to create a lively effect.

While somewhat contested, the standard substitution theory, also referred to as the “similarity theory,” generally defines metaphor as a stylistic literary device involving a deviant and dyadic movement which shifts meaning from one word to another. This view, first and most thoroughly articulated by Aristotle, reinforces the epistemic primacy of the literal, where metaphor can only operate as a secondary device, one which is dependent on the prior level of ordinary descriptive language, where the first-order language in itself contains nothing metaphorical. In most cases, the relation between two orders, literal and figurative, has been interpreted as an implicit simile, which expresses a “this is that” structure. For example, Aristotle mentions, in Poetics: 

When the poet says of Achilles that he “Leapt on the foe as a lion,” this is a simile; when he says of him, “the lion leapt” it is a metaphor—here, since both are courageous, [Homer] has transferred to Achilles the name of “lion.” (1406b 20-3)

In purely conventional terms, poetic language can only be said to refer to itself; that is, it can accomplish imaginative description through metaphorical attribution, but the description does not refer to any reality outside of itself. For the purposes of traditional rhetoric and poetics in the Aristotelian mode, metaphor may serve many purposes; it can be clever, creative, or eloquent, but never true in terms of referring to new propositional content. This is due to the restriction of comparison to substitution, such that the cognitive impact of the metaphoric transfer of meaning is produced by assuming similarities between literal and figurative domains of objects and the descriptive predicates attributed to them.

The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, however, not only challenges the substitution model, it advances the role of metaphor far beyond the limits of traditional rhetoric. In the Continental philosophical tradition, the most extensive developments of metaphor’s place in phenomenology are found in the work of Martin Heidegger, Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida. They all, in slightly different ways, see figurative language as the primary vehicle for the disclosure and creation of new forms of meaning which emerge from an ontological, rather than purely epistemic or objectifying engagement with the world.

a. The Conventional View: Aristotle’s Contribution to Substitution Model

Metaphor consists in giving the thing a name that belongs to something else; the transference being either from species to genus, or from genus to species, or from species to species, on the grounds of analogy. (Poetics 1457b 6-9)

 While his philosophical predecessor Plato condemns the use of figurative speech for its role in rhetorike, “the art of persuasion,” Aristotle recognizes its stylistic merits and provides us with the first systematic analysis of metaphor and its place in literature and the mimetic arts. His briefer descriptions of how metaphors are to be used can be found in Rhetoric and Poetics, while his extended analysis of how metaphor operates within the context of language as a whole can be inferred by reading On Interpretation together with Metaphysics. The descriptive use of metaphor can be understood as an extension of its meaning; the term derives from the Greek metaphora, from metaphero, meaning “to transfer or carry over.” Thus, the figurative trope emerges from a movement of substitution, involving the transference of a word to a new sense, one which compares or juxtaposes seemingly unrelated subjects.  For example, in Shakespeare’s Sonnet 73:

In me thou seest the glowing of such fire,
That on the ashes of his youth doth lie…

The narrator directly transfers and applies the “dying ember” image in a new “foreign” sense: his own awareness of his waning youth.

This is Aristotle’s contribution to the standard substitution model of metaphor. It is to be understood as a linguistic device, widely applied but remaining within the confines of rhetoric and poetry. Though it does play a central role in social persuasion, metaphor, restricted by the mechanics of similarity and substitution, does not carry with it any speculative or philosophical importance. Metaphors may point out underlying similarities between objects and their descriptive categories, and may instruct through adding liveliness and elegance to speech, but they do not refer, in the strong sense, to a form of propositional knowledge.

The formal structure of substitution operates in the following manner: the first subject or entity under description in one context is characterized as equivalent in some way to the second entity derived from another context; it is either implied or stated that the first entity “is” the second entity in some way. The metaphorical attribution occurs when certain select properties from the second entity are imposed on the first in order to characterize it in some distinctive way. Metaphor relies on pre-existing categories which classify objects and their properties; these categories guide the ascription of predicates to objects, and since metaphor may entail a kind of violation of this order, it cannot itself refer to a “real” class of existing objects or the relations between them. Similarly, in poetry, metaphor serves not as a foundation for knowledge, but as a tool for mimesis or artistic imitation, representing the actions in epic tragedy or mythos in order to move and instruct the emotions of the audience for the purpose of catharsis.

Aristotle’s theory and its significance for philosophy can only be fully understood in terms of the wider context of denotation and reference which supports the classical realist epistemology. Metaphor is found within his taxonomy of speech forms; additionally, simile is subordinate to metaphor and both are figures of speech falling under the rubric of lexis/diction, which itself is composed of individual linguistic units or noun-names and verbs. Lexis operates within the unity of logos, meaning that the uses of various forms of speech must conform to the overall unity of language and reason, held together by categorical structures of being found in Aristotle’s metaphysics.

As a result of Aristotle’s combined thinking in these works, it turns out that the ostensive function of naming individual objects (“this” name standing for “this object” or property) allows for the clear demarcation between the literal and figurative meanings for names. Thus, the noun-name can work as a signifier of meaning in two domains, the literal and the non-literal. However, there remains an unresolved problem: the categorical nature of the boundary between literal and figurative domains will be a point of contention for many contemporary critiques of the theory coming from phenomenological philosophy.

Furthermore, the denotative theory has served in support of the referential function of language, one which assumes a system of methodological connections between language, sense perceptions, mental states, and the external world. The referential relation between language and its objects serves the correspondence theory of truth, in that the truth-bearing capacity of language corresponds to valid perception and cognition of the external world. The theory assumes that these sets of correspondences allow for the consistent and reliable relation of reference between words, images, and objects.

Aristotle accounts for this kind of correspondence in the following way: sense perceptions’s pathemata give rise to the psychological states in which object representations are formed. These states are actually likenesses (isomorphisms) of the external objects. Thus, names for things refer to the things themselves, mental representations of those things, and to the class-based meanings.

If, as Aristotle assumes, the meaning of metaphor rests on the level of the noun-name, its distinguishing feature lies in its deviation, a “something which happens” to the noun/name by virtue of a transfer (epiphora) of meaning. Here, Aristotle creates a metaphor (based on physical movement) in order to explain metaphor. The term “phora” refers to a change in location from one place to another, to which is added the prefix “epi:” epiphora refers then to the transfer of the common proper name of the thing to the new, unfamiliar, alien (allotrios) place or object. Furthermore, the transference (or substitution), borrowing as it does the alien name for the thing, does not disrupt the overall unity of meaning or logical order of correspondence within the denotative system; all such movement remains within the classifications of genus and species.

The metaphoric transfer of meaning will become a significant point of debate and speculation in later philosophical discussions. Although Aristotle himself does not explore the latent philosophical questions in his own theory, subsequent philosophers of language have over the years recast these issues, exploring the challenges to meaning, reference, and correspondence that present themselves in the substitution theory. What happens, on these various levels, when we substitute one object or descriptor of a “natural kind,” to a foreign object domain? It may the be the case that metaphorical transference calls into question the limits of all meaning-bearing categories, and in turn, the manner in which words can be said to “refer” to specific objects and their attributes. By virtue of the epiphoric movement, species and genus attributes of disparate objects fall into relations of kinship, opposition, or deviation among the various ontological categories. These relations allow for the metaphoric novelty which will subsequently fuel the development of alternative theories, those which view as fundamental to our cognitive or conceptual processes. At this point the analysis of metaphor opens up the philosophical space for further debate and interpretation.

b. The Philosophical Issues

In any theory of metaphor, there are significant philosophical implications for the transfer of meaning from one object-domain or context of associations to another. The metaphor, unlike its sister-trope the analogy, creates a new form of predication, suggesting that one category or class of objects (with certain characteristics) can be projected onto another separate class of entities; this projection may require a blurring of the ontological and epistemological distinctions between the kinds of objects that can be said to exist, either in the mind or in the external world. Returning to the Shakespearean metaphor above, what are the criteria that we use to determine whether a dying ember aptly fits the state of the narrator’s consciousness? What are the perceptual and ontological connections between fire and human existence? The first problem lies in how we are to explain the initial “fit” between any predicate category and its objects. Another problem comes to the forefront when we try to account for how metaphors enable us to think in new ways. If we are to move beyond the standard substitution model, we are compelled to investigate the specific mental operations that enable us to create metaphoric representations; we need to elaborate upon the processes which connect particular external objects (and their properties) given to sensory experience to linguistic signs “referring” to a new kind of object, knowledge context, or domain of experience.

According to the standard model, a metaphor’s ability to signify is restricted by ordinary denotation. The metaphor, understood as a new name, is conceived as a function of individual terms, rather than sentences or wider forms of discourse (narratives, texts). As Continental phenomenology develops in the late 19th and 20th centuries, we are presented with radically alternative theories which obscure strict boundaries between the literal and the figurative, disrupting the connections between perception, language, and thought. Namely, the phenomenological, interactionist, and cognitive treatments of metaphor defend the view that metaphorical language and symbol serve as indirect routes to novel ways of knowing and describing human experience. In their own ways, these theories will call into question the validity and usefulness of correspondence and reference, especially in theoretical disciplines such as philosophy, theology, literature, and science.

Although this article largely focuses on explicating phenomenological theories of metaphor, it should be noted that in all three theories mentioned above, metaphor is displaced from its formerly secondary position in substitution theory to occupying the front and center of our cognitive capabilities. Understood as the product of intentional structures in the mind, metaphor now becomes conceptual, rather than merely ornamental, acting as a conduit through which we take apart and re-assemble the concepts we use to describe the varieties and nuances of experience. They all share in the assumption that metaphors suggest, posit, or disclose similarities between objects and domains of experience (where there seem to be none), without explicitly recognizing that a comparison is being made between two sometimes very different kinds of things or events. These theories, when applied to our original metaphor (“in me thou seest…”) contend that at times, there need not be any explicit similarity between states of awareness or existence as “fire” or “ashes”.

c. Nietzsche’s Role in Development of Phenomenological Theories of Metaphor

In Nietzsche’s thought we see an early turning away from the substitution theory and its reliance on the correspondence theory of truth, denotation, and reference. His description of metaphor takes us back to its primordial “precognitive” or ontological origins; Nietzsche acts here as a pre-cursor to later developments, yet in itself his analysis offers a compelling account of the power of metaphor. Though his remarks on metaphor are somewhat scattered, they can be found in the early writings of 1872-74, Nachgelassene Fragmente, and “On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense” (see W. Kaufman’s translation in The Portable Nietzsche). Together with the “Rhetorik” lectures, these writings argue for a genealogical explanation of the conceptual, displacing traditional philosophical categories into the metaphorical realm. In doing so, he deconstructs our conventional reliance on the idea that meaningful language must reflect a system of logical correspondences.

With correspondence, we can only assume we are in possession of the truth when our representations or ideas about the world “match up” with external states of affairs. We have already seen how Aristotle’s system of first-order predication supports correspondence, as it is enabled through the denotative ascription of predicates/categorical features of /to objects. But Nietzsche boldly suggests that we are, from the outset, already in metaphor and he works from this starting point. The concepts and judgments we use to describe reality do not flatly reflect pre-existing similarities or causal relationships between themselves and our physical intuitions about reality, they are themselves metaphorical constructions; that is, they are creative forms of differentiation emerging out of a deeper undifferentiated primordiality of being. The truth of the world is more closely reflected in the Dionysian level of pure aesthetic immersion into an “undecipherable” innermost essence of things.

Even in his early work, The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche rejects the long-held assumption that truth is an ordering of concepts expressed through rigid linguistic categories, putting forth the alternative view which gives primacy to symbol as the purest, most elemental form of representation. That which is and must be expressed is produced organically, out of the flux of nature and yielding a “becoming” rather than being.

In the Dionysian dithyramb man is incited to the greatest exaltation of all his symbolic faculties; something never before experienced struggles for utterance—the annihilation of the veil of maya, … oneness as the soul of the race and of nature itself. The essence of nature is now to be expressed symbolically; we need a new world of symbols.… (BOT Ch. 2)

Here, following Schopenhauer, he reverses Aristotelian transference of concept-categories from the literal to the figurative, and makes the figurative the original mode for representation of experience. The class terms “species” and “genus”, based in Aristotle and so important in classical and medieval epistemology, only appear to originate and validate themselves in “dialectics and through scientific reflection.” For Nietzsche, the categories hide their real nature, abiding as frozen metaphors which reflect previously experienced levels of natural experience metaphorically represented in our consciousness. They emerge through construction indirectly based in vague images or names for things, willed into being out of the unnamed flowing elements of biological existence. Even Thales the pre-Socratic, we are reminded, in his attempt to give identity to the underlying unity of all things, falls back on a conceptualization of it as water without realizing he is using a metaphor.

Once we construct and begin to apply our concepts, their metaphorical origins are forgotten or concealed from ordinary awareness. This theoretical process is but another attempt to restore “the also-forgotten” original unity of being. The layering of metaphors, the archeological ancestors of concepts, is specifically linked to our immediate experiential capacity to transcend the proper and the individual levels of experience and linguistic signs. We cannot, argues Nietzsche, construct metaphors without breaking out of the confines of singularity, thus we must reject the artificiality of designating separate names for separate things. To assume that an individual name would completely and transparently describe its referent (in perception) is to also assume that language and external experience mirror one another in some perfect way. It is rather the case that language transfers meaning from place to place. The terms metapherein and Übertragung are equivalently applied here; if external experience is in constant flux, it is not possible to reduplicate exact and individual meanings. To re-describe things through metaphor is to “leave out” and “carry-over” meaning, to undergo a kind of dispossession of self, thing, place, and time and an overcoming of both individualisms and dualities. Thus the meaningful expression of the real is seen and experienced most directly in the endlessly creative activity of art and music, rather than philosophy.

2. The Phenomenological Theory in Continental Philosophy

Versions of Nietzsche’s “metaphorization” of thought will reappear in the Continental philosophers described below; those who owe their phenomenological attitudes to Husserl, but disagree with his transcendental idealization of meaning, one which demands that we somehow separate the world of experience from the essential meanings of objects in that world. Taken together, these philosophers call into question the position that truth entails a relationship of correspondence between dual aspects of reality, one internal to our minds and the other external. We consider Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida as the primary examples. For Heidegger, metaphoric language signals a totality or field of significance in which being discloses or reveals itself. Ricoeur’s work, in turn, builds upon aspects of Heidegger’s ontological hermeneutics, explicating how it is the case that metaphors drive speculative reflection. In Ricoeur’s model, the literal level is subverted, and metaphoric language and symbols containing “semantic kernels” create structures of double reference in all figurative forms of discourse. These structures point beyond themselves in symbols and texts, serving as mediums which reveal new worlds of meaning and existential possibilities.

French philosopher Jacques Derrida, on the other hand, reiterates the Nietzschean position; metaphor does not subvert metaphysics, but rather is itself the hidden source of all conceptual structures.

a. Phenomenological Method: Husserl

Edmund Husserl’s phenomenological method laid the groundwork, in the early 20th century, for what would eventually take shape in the phenomenological philosophies of Martin Heidegger, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Jean-Paul Sartre. Husserl’s early work provides the foundation for exploring how these modes of presentation convey the actual meaningful contents of experience. He means to address here the former distinction made by Kant between the phenomenal appearances of the real (to consciousness) and the noumenal reality of the things-in-themselves. Husserl, broadly speaking, seeks to resolve not only what some see as a problematic dualism in Kant, but also some philosophical problems that accompany Hegel’s constructivist phenomenology.

Taken in its entirety, Husserl’s project demonstrates a major shift in the 20th century phenomenology, seeking a rigorous method for the description and analysis of consciousness and the contents given to it. He intends his method to be the scientific grounding for philosophy; it is to be a critique of psychologism and a return to a universal knowledge of “the things themselves,” those intelligible objects apprehended by and given to consciousness.

In applying this method we seek, Husserl argues, a scientific foundation for universally objective knowledge; adhering to the “pure description” of phenomena given to consciousness through the perception of objects. If those objects are knowable, it is because they are immediate in conscious experience. It is through the thorough description of these objects as they appear to us in terms of color, shape, and so forth, that we apprehend that which is essential – what we call “essences” or meanings. Here, the act of description is a method for avoiding a metaphysical trap: that of imposing these essences or object meanings onto the contents of mental experience. Noesis, for Husserl, achieves its aim by including within itself (giving an account of) the role that context or horizon plays in delineating possible objects for experience. This will have important implications for later phenomenological theories of metaphor, in that metaphors may be said intend new figurative contexts in which being appears to us in new ways.

In Ideen (30), Husserl explains how such a horizon or domain of experience presents a set of criteria for us to apply. We choose and identify an object as a single member of a class of objects, and so these regions of subjective experience, also called regions of phenomena, circumscribe certain totalities or generic unities to which concrete items belong. In order to understand the phenomenological approach to meaning-making, it is first necessary to clarify what we mean by “phenomenological description,” as it is described in Logical Investigations. Drawing upon the work of Brentano and Meinong, Husserl develops a set of necessary structural relations between the knower (ego), the objects of experience, and the horizon within which those objects are given. The relation is characterized in an axiomatic manner as intentionality, where the subjective consciousness and its objects are correlates brought together in a psychological act. Subjectivity contributes to and makes possible cognition; specifically, it must be the case that perception and cognition are always about something given in the stream of consciousness, they are only possible because consciousness intends or refers to these immanent objects. As we shall presently see, the intentional nature of consciousness applies to Ricoeur’s hermeneutics of the understanding, bestowing metaphor with a special ability to expand (to nearly undermining) the structure of reference in a non-literal sense to an existential state.

Husserl’s stage like development of phenomenology unveils the structure of intentionality as derived from the careful description of certain mental acts. Communicable linguistic expressions, such as names and sentences, exist only in so far as they exhibit intentional meanings for speakers. Written or spoken expressions only carry references to objects because they have meanings for speakers and knowers. If we examine all of our mental perceptions, we find it impossible to think without intending an object of some sort. Both Continental and Anglo-American thinkers agree that metaphor holds the key to understanding these processes, as it re-organizes our senses of perception, temporality, and relation of subject to object, referring to these as subjects of existential concern and possibility.

b. Heidegger’s Contribution

Heidegger, building upon the phenomenological thematic, asserts that philosophical analysis should keep to careful description of the human encounter with the world, revealing the modes in which being is existentially or relationally given. This signals both a nod to and departure from Husserl, leading to a rethinking of phenomenology which replaces the theoretical apprehension of meaning with an “uncovering” of being as it is lived out in experiential contexts or horizons. Later, Ricoeur will draw on Heidegger’s “existentialized” intentionality as he characterizes the referential power of metaphors to signal those meanings waiting to be “uncovered’ by Dasein’s (human as being-there) experience of itself – in relation to others, and to alternate worlds of possibility.

As his student, Heidegger owes to Husserl the phenomenological intent to capture “the things themselves” (die Sachen selbst), however, the Heideggerian project outlined in Being and Time rejects the attempt to establish phenomenology as a science of the structures of consciousness and reforms it in ontologically disclosive or manifestational terms. Heidegger’s strong attraction to the hermeneutic tradition in part originates in his dialogue with Wilhem Dilthey, the 19th century thinker who stressed the importance of historical consciousness attitude in guiding the work of the social sciences and hermeneutics, directed toward the understanding of primordial experience. Dilthey’s influence on Heidegger and Ricoeur (as well as Gadamer) is evident, in that all recognize the historical life of humans as apprehended in the study of the text (a form of spirit), particularly those containing metaphors and narratives conveying a lived, concrete experience of religious life.

Heidegger rejects the notion that the structures of consciousness are internally maintained as transcendentally subjective and also directed towards their transcendental object. Phenomenology must now be tied to the problems of human existence, and must then direct itself immediately towards the lived world and allow this “beholding” of the world to guide the work of “its own uncovering.”

Heidegger argues for a return to the original Greek definitions of the terms phainonmenon (derived from phainesthai, or “that which shows itself”) and logos. Heidegger adopts these terms for his own purposes, utilizing them to reinforce the dependence of ontological disclosure or presence: those beings showing themselves or letting themselves be “seen-as.” The pursuit of aletheia, (“truth as recovering of the forgotten aspects of being”) is now fulfilled through adherence to a method of self-interpretation achieved from the standpoint of Dasein’s (humanity’s) subjectivity, which has come to replace the transcendental ego of Kant and Husserl.

The turn to language, in this case, must be more than simple communication between persons; it is a primordial feature of subjectivity. Language is to be the interpretive medium of the understanding through which all forms of being present themselves to subjective apprehension. In this way, Heidegger replaces the transcendental version of phenomenology with the disclosive, where the structure of interpretation provides further insight into his ontological purposes of the understanding.

3. Existential Phenomenology: Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics, and Metaphor

The linguistic turn in phenomenology has been most directly applied to metaphor in the works of Paul Ricoeur, who revisits Husserlian and Heideggerian themes in his extensive treatment of metaphor. He extends his analysis of metaphor into a fully developed discursive theory of symbol, focusing on those found in religious texts and sacred narratives. His own views follow from what he thinks are overly limited structuralist theories of symbol, which, in essence, do not provide a theory of linguistic reference useful for his own hermeneutic project. For Ricoeur, a proper theory of metaphor understands it to be “a re-appropriation of our effort to exist,” echoing Nietszche’s call to go back to the primordiality of being. Metaphor must then include the notion that such language is expressive and constitutive of the being of those who embark on philosophical reflection.

Much of Ricoeur’s thought can be characterized by his well-known statement “the symbol gives rise to the thought.” Ricoeur shares Heidegger’s and Husserl’s assumptions: we reflectively apprehend or grasp the structures of human experience as they are presented to temporalized subjective consciousness While the “pure” phenomenology of Husserl seeks a transparent description of experience as it is lived out in phases or moments, Ricoeur, also following Nietzsche, centers the creation of meaning in the existential context. The noetic act originates in the encounter with a living text, constituting “a horizon of possibilities,” for the meaning of existence, thus abandoning the search for essences internal to the objects we experience in the world.

His foundational work in The Symbolism of Evil and The Rule of Metaphor places the route to human understanding concretely, via symbolic expressions which allow for the phenomenological constitution, reflection, and re-appropriation of experience. These processes are enabled by the structure of “seeing-as,” adding to Heidegger’s insight with the metaphoric acting as a “refiguring” of that which is given to consciousness. At various points he enters into conversation with Max Black and Nelson Goodman, among others, who also recognize the cognitive contributions to science and art found in the models and metaphors. In Ricoeur’s case, sacred metaphors display the same second-order functions shared by those in the arts and sciences, but with a distinctively ontological emphasis: “the interpretation of symbols is worthy of being called a hermeneutics only insofar as it is a part of self-understanding and of the understanding of being” (COI 30).

In The Rule of Metaphor, Ricoeur, departing from Aristotle, locates the signifying power of metaphor primarily at the level of the sentence, not individual terms. Metaphor is to be understood as a discursive linguistic act which achieves its purpose through extended predication rather than simple substitution of names. Ricoeur, like so many language philosophers, argues that Aristotelian substitution is incomplete; it does not go far enough in accounting for the semantic, syntactic, logical, and ontological issues that accompany the creation of a metaphor. The standard substitution model cannot do justice to potential for metaphor create meaning by working in tandem with propositional thought-structures (sentences). To these ends, Ricoeur’s study in The Rule of Metaphor replaces substitution and strict denotative theories with a theory of language that works through a structure of double reference.

Taking his lead while diverging from Aristotle, Ricoeur reads the metaphorical transfer of a name as a kind of “category mistake” which produces an imaginative construction about the new way objects may be related to one another. He expands this dynamic of “meaning transfer” on to the level of the sentence, then text, enabling the production of a second-order discursive level of thinking whereby all forms of symbolic language become phenomenological disclosures of being.

The discussion begins with the linguistic movement of epiphora (transfer of names-predicates) taken from an example in Poetics. A central dynamic exists in transposing one term, with one set of meaning-associations onto another. Citing Aristotle’s own example of “sowing around a god-created flame,”

If A = light of the sun, B = action of the sun, C = grain, and D = sowing, then

B is to A, as D is to C

We see action of the sun is to light as sowing is to grain, however, B is a vague action term (sun’s action) which is both missing and implied; Ricoeur calls this a “nameless act” which establishes a similar relation to the object, sunlight, as sowing is to the grain. In this act the phenomenological space for the creation of new meaning is opened up, precisely because we cannot find a conventional word to take the place of a metaphorical word. The nameless act implies that the transfer of an alien name entails more than a simple substitution of concepts, and is therefore said to be logically disruptive.

a. The Mechanics of Conceptual Blending

The “nameless act” entails a kind of “cognitive leap:’’ since there is no conventional term for B, the act does not involve substituting a decorative term in its place. Rather, a new meaning association has been created through the semantic gap between the objects. The absence of the original literal term, the “semantic void”, cannot be filled without the creation of a metaphor which signals the larger discursive context of the sentence and eventually, the text. If, as above, the transfer of predicates (the sowing of grain as casting of flames) challenges the “rules” of meaning dictated by ostensive theory, we are forced to make a new connection where there was none, between the conventional and metaphorical names for the object. For Ricoeur, the figurative (sowing around a flame) acts as hermeneutic medium in that it negates and displaces the original term, signifying a “new kind of object” which is in fact a new form (logos) of being. The metaphorical statement allows us to say that an object is and is not what we usually call it. The sense-based aspect is then “divorced” from predication and subsequently, logos is emptied of its objective meaning; the new object may be meaningful but not clear under the conditions of strict denotation or natural knowledge.

We take note that the “new object” (theoretically speaking) has more than figurative existence; the newly formed subject-predicate relation places the copula at the center of the name-object (ROM 18). Ricoeur’s objective is to create a dialectically driven process which produces a new ‘object-domain’ or category of being. Following the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung, (through the aforementioned negation and displacement) the new name has opened up a new field of meaning to be re-appropriated into our reflective consciousness. This is how Ricoeur deconstructs first-order reference in order to develop an ontology of sacred language based on second-order reference.

We are led to the view that myths are modes of discourse whose meanings are phenomenological spaces of openness, creating a nearly infinite range of interpretations. Thus we see how metaphor enables being, as Aristotle notes, to “be said in many ways.”

Ricoeur argues that second-order discursivity “violates” the pre-existing first order of genus and species, in turn causing a kind of upheaval among further relations and rules set by the categories: namely subordination, coordination, proportionality or equality among object properties. Something of a unity of being remains, yet for Ricoeur this non-generic unity or enchainement, corresponds to a single generic context referring to “Being,” restricting the senses or applications of transferred predicates in the metaphoric context.

b. The Role of Kant’s Schematism in Conceptual Blending

The notion of a “non-generic unity” raises, perhaps, more philosophical problems than it answers. How are we to explain the mechanics which blend descriptors from one object domain and its sets of perceptions, to a domain of foreign objects? Ricoeur addresses the epistemic issues surrounding the transfer of names from one category to another in spatiotemporal experience by importing Kant’s theory of object construction, found in the Critique of Pure Reason. In the “Transcendental Schematism”, Kant establishes the objective validity of the conceptual categories we use to synthesize the contents of experience. In this section, Kant elevates the Aristotelian categories from grammatical principles to formal structures intrinsic to reason. Here, he identifies an essential problem for knowledge: how are we to conceive a relationship between these pure concept-categories of the understanding and the sensible objects given to us in space and time? With the introduction of the schematism, Kant seeks a resolution to the various issues inherent to the construction of mental representations (a position shared by contemporary cognitive scientists; see below). For Ricoeur, this serves to answer the problem of how metaphoric representations of reality can actually “refer” to reality (even if only at the existential level of experience).

Kant states “the Schematism” is a “sensible condition under which alone pure concepts of the understanding can be employed” (CPR/A 136). Though the doctrine is sometimes said to be notoriously confusing due to its circular nature, the schemata are meant as a distinctive set of mediating representations, rules, or operators in the mind which themselves display the universal and necessary characteristics of sensible objects; these characteristics are in turn synthesized and unified by the activity of the transcendental imagination.

In plainer terms, the schematic function is used by the imagination to guide it in the construction of images. It does not seem to be any kind of picture of an object, but rather the “form” or “listing” of how we produce the picture. For Ricoeur, the schematism lends the structural support for assigning an actual truth-value or cognitive contribution to the semantic innovation produced by metaphor. The construction of new meaning via new forms of predication entails a re-organization and re-interpretation of pre-existing forms, and the operations of the productive imagination enable the entire process.

In the work Figuring the Sacred, for example, Ricoeur, answering to his contemporary Mircea Eliade ( The Sacred and The Profane), moves metaphor beyond the natural “boundedness” of myths and symbols. While these manifest meaning, they are still constrained in that they must mirror the natural cosmic order of things. Metaphor, on the other hand, occupies the center of a “hermeneutic of proclamation;” it has the power to proclaim because it is a “free invention of discourse.” Ricoeur specifically explicates biblical parables, proverbs, and eschatological statements as extended metaphorical processes. Thus, “The Kingdom of God will not come with signs that you can observe. Do not say, ‘It is here; it is there.’ Behold the kingdom of God is among you” (Luke 17:20-21). This saying creates meaning by breaking down our ordinary or familiar temporal frameworks applied to interpretation of signs (of the kingdom). The quest for signs is, according to Ricoeur, “overthrown” for the sake of “a completely new existential signification” (FS 59).

This discussion follows from the earlier work in The Rule of Metaphor, where the mechanics of representation behind this linguistic act of “re-description” are further developed. The act points us towards a novel ontological domain of human possibility, enabled through new cognitive content. The linguistic act of creating a metaphor in essence becomes a hermeneutic act directed towards a gap which must be bridged, that between the abstract (considerations of reflection) understanding (Verstehen) and the finite living out of life. In this way Ricoeur’s theory, often contrasted with that of Derrida, takes metaphor beyond the mechanics of substitution.

4. Jacques Derrida: Metaphor as Metaphysics

In general, Derrida's deconstructive philosophy can be read as a radically alternative way of reading philosophical texts and arguments, viewing them in a novel way through the lens of a rhetorical methodology. This will amount to the taking apart of established ways in which philosophers define perception, concept formation, meaning, and reference.

Derrida, from the outset, will call into question the assumption that the formation of concepts (logos) somehow escapes the primordiality of language and the fundamentally metaphorical-mythical nature of philosophical discourse. In a move which goes much further than Ricoeur, Derrida argues for what Guiseseppe Stellardi so aptly calls the “reverse metaphorization of concepts.” The reversal is such that there can be no final separation between the linguistic-metaphorical and the philosophical realms. These domains are co-constitutive of one another, in the sense that either one cannot be fully theorized or made to fully or transparently explain the meaning of the other. The result is that language acquires a certain obscurity, ascendancy, and autonomy. It will permanently elude our attempts to fix its meaning-making activity in foundational terms which necessitate a transcendent or externalized (to language) unified being.

Derrida's White Mythology offers a penetrating critique of the common paradigm involving the nature of concepts, posing the following questions: “Is there metaphor in the text of philosophy, and if so, how?” Here, the history of philosophy is characterized as an economy, a kind of "usury" where meaning and valuation are understood as metaphorical processes involving “gain and loss.” The process is represented through Derrida’s well-known image of the coin:

I was thinking how the Metaphysicians, when they make a language for themselves, are like … knife-grinders, who instead of knives and scissors, should put medals and coins to the grindstone to efface … the value… When they have worked away till nothing is visible in these crown pieces, neither King Edward, the Emperor William, nor the Republic, they say: 'These pieces have nothing either English, German, or French about them; we have freed them from all limits of time and space; they are not worth five shillings any more ; they are of inestimable value, and their exchange value is extended indefinitely.’ (WM 210).

The “usury” of the sign (the coin) signifies the passage from the physical to the metaphysical. Abstractions now become “worn out” metaphors; they seem like defaced coins, their original, finite values now replaced by a vague or rough idea of the meaning-images that may have been present in the originals.

Such is the movement which simultaneously creates and masks the construction of concepts. Concepts, whose real origins have been forgotten, now only yield an empty sort of philosophical promise – that of “the absolute”, the universalized, unlimited “surplus value” achieved by the eradication of the sensory or momentarily given. Derrida reads this process along a negative Hegelian line: the metaphysicians are most attracted to “concepts in the negative, ab-solute, in-finite, non-Being” (WM 121). That is, their love of the most abstract concept, made that way “by long and universal use”, reveals a preference for the construction of a metaphysics of Being. This is made possible via the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung. The German term refers to a dynamic of sublation where the dialectical, progressive movement of consciousness overcomes and subsumes the particular, concrete singularities of experience through successive moments of cognition. Derrida levels a strong criticism against Hegel’s attempts to overcome difference, arguing that consciousness as understood by Hegel takes on the quality of building an oppressive sort of narrative, subsuming the particular and the momentary under an artificial theoretical gaze. Derrida prefers giving theoretical privilege to the negative; that is, to the systematic negation of all finite determinations of meaning derived from particular aspects of particular beings.

Echoing Heidegger, Derrida conceives of metaphysical constructs as indicative of the Western "logocentric epoch" in philosophy. They depend for their existence on the machinery of binary logic. They remain static due to our adherence to the meaning of ousia (essence), the definition of being based on self-identitical substance, which can only be predicated or expressed in either/or terms. Reference to being, in this case, is constrained within the field of the proper and univocal. Both Heidegger and Derrida, and to some degree Ricoeur seek to free reference from these constraints. Unlike Heidegger, however, Derrida does not work from the assumption that being indicates some unified primordial reality.

For Derrida, there lies hidden within the merely apparent logical unity (with its attendant binary oppositions) or logocentricity of consciousness a white mythology, masking the primitive plurivocity of being which eludes all attempts to name it. Here we find traces of lost meanings, reminiscent of the lost inscriptions on coins. These are “philosophemes,” words, tropes or modes of figuration which do not express ideas or abstract representations of things (grounded in categories), but rather invoke a radically plurivocal notion of meaning. Having thus dismantled the logic of either/or with difference (difference), Derrida gives priority to ambiguity, in “both/and” and “neither/nor” modes of thought and expression. Meaning must then be constituted of and by difference, rather than identity, for difference subverts all preconceived theoretical or ontological structures. It is articulated in the context of all linguistic relations and involves ongoing displacement of a final idealized and unified form of meaning; such displacement reveals through hints and traces, the reality and experience of a disruptive alterity in meaning and being. Alterity is “always already there” by virtue of the presence of the Other.

With the introduction of “the white mythology,” Derrida’s alignment with Nietszche creates a strong opposition to traditional Western theoria. Forms of abstract ideation and theoretical systems representing the oppressive consciousness of the “white man,” built in the name of reason/logos, are in themselves a collection of analogies, existing as colorless dead metaphors whose primitive origins lie in the figurative realms of myths, symbol, and fable.

Derrida's project, resulting as it does in the deconstruction of metaphysics, runs counter to Ricoeur's tensive theory. In contrast to Heidegger’s restrained criticism Derrida’s deconstruction appears to Ricoeur “unbounded.” That is, Ricoeur still assumes a distinction between the speculative and the poetic, where the poetic “drives the speculative” to explicate a surplus of meaning. The surplus, or plurivocity is problematic from Derrida's standpoint. The latter argues that the theory remains logocentric in that it remains true to the binary mode of identity and difference which underlie metaphysical distinctions such as “being and non-being.” For Ricoeur, metaphors create a new space for meaning based on the tension between that which is (can be properly predicated of an object) and that which “is not” (which cannot be predicated of an object). Derrida begs to differ: in the final analysis, there can be no such separation, systematic philosophical theory or set of conceptual structures through which we subsume and “explain” the cognitive or existential value of metaphor.

Derrida's reverse metaphorization of concepts does not support a plurivocal characterization of meaning and being, it does not posit a wider referential field; for Derrida metaphors and concepts remain in a complex, always ambiguous relation to one another. Thus he seems to do away with “reference,” or the distinction between signifier and signified, moving even beyond polysemy (the many potential meaning that words carry). The point here is to preserve the flux of sense and the ongoing dissemination of meaning and otherness.

a. The Dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida

The dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida regarding the referential power of metaphor lies in where they position themselves with regard to Aristotle. Ricoeur's position, in giving priority to the noun-phrase instead of the singular name, challenges Aristotle while still appealing to the original taxonomy (categories) of being based on an architectonic system of predication. For Ricoeur, metaphoric signification mimics the fundamentally equivocal nature of being—we cannot escape the ontological implications of Aristotle’s statement: being can be “said in many ways.” Nevertheless, Ricoeur maintains the distinction between mythos and logos, for we need the tools provided by speculative discourse to explain the polysemic value of metaphors.

Derrida’s deconstruction reaches back to dismantle Aristotle's theory, rooted as it is in the ontology of the proper name/noun (onoma) which signifies a thing as self-identical being (homousion). This, states Derrida, “reassembles and reflects the culture of the West; the white man takes his own mythology, Indo-European mythology, his own logos, that is, the mythos of his idiom, for the universal form of that he must still wish to call Reason” (WM 213).

The original theory makes metaphor yet another link in the logocentric chain—a form of metaphysical oppression. If the value of metaphor is restricted to the transference of names, then metaphor entails a loss or negation of the literal which is still under the confines of a notion of discourse which upholds the traditional formulations of representation and reference in terms of the mimetic and the “proper” which are, in turn, based on a theory of perception (and an attendant metaphysics) that gives priority to resemblance, identity, or what we can call “the law of the same.”

5. Anglo-American Philosophy: Interactionist Theories

Contemporary phenomenological theories of metaphor directly challenge the straightforward theory of reference, replacing the ordinary propositional truth based on denotation with a theory of language which designates and discloses its referents. These interactionist theories carry certain Neo-Kantian features, particularly in the work of the analytic philosophers Nelson Goodman and Max Black. They posit the view that metaphors can reorganize the connections we make between our perceptions of the world. Their theories reflect certain phenomenological assumptions about the ways in which figurative language expands the referential field, allowing for the creation of novel meanings and creating new possibilities for constructing models of reality; in moving between the realms of art and science, metaphors have an interdisciplinary utility. Both Goodman and Black continue to challenge the traditional theory of linguistic reference, offering instead the argument that reference is enabled by the manipulation of predicates in figurative modes of thinking through language.


6. Metaphor, Phenomenology, and Cognitive Science

Recent studies underscore the connections between metaphors, mapping, and schematizing aspects of cognitive organization in mental life. Husserl’s approach to cognition took an anti-naturalist stance, opposed to defining consciousness as an objective entity and therefore unsuited to studying the workings of subjective consciousness; instead his phenomenological stance gave priority to subjectivity, since it constitutes the necessary set of pre-conditions for knowing anything at all as an object or a meaning. Recently, the trend has been renewed and phenomenology has made some productive inroads into the examination of connectionist and embodied approaches to perception, cognition and other sorts of dynamic and adaptive (biological) systems.

Zahavi and Thompson, for example, see strong links between Husserlian phenomenology and philosophy of mind with respect to the phenomena of consciousness, where the constitutive nature of subjective consciousness is clarified specifically in terms of the forms and relations of different kinds of intentional mental states. These involve the unity of temporal experience, the structural relations between intentional mental acts and their objects, and the inherently embodied nature of cognition. Those who study the embodied mind do not all operate in agreement with traditional phenomenological assumptions and methods. Nevertheless, some “naturalized” versions in the field of consciousness studies are now gaining ground, offering viable solutions to the kind of problematic Cartesian dualistic metaphysics that Husserl’s phenomenology suggests.

a. The Embodied Mind

In recent years, the expanding field of cognitive science has explored the role of metaphor in the formation of consciousness (cognition and perception). In a general sense, it appears that contemporary cognitivist, constructivist, and systems (as in self-organizing) approaches to the study of mind incorporate metaphor as a tool for developing an anti-metaphysical, anti-positivist theory of mind, in an attempt to reject any residual Cartesian and Kantian psychologies. The cognitive theories, however, remain partially in debt to Kantian schematism and its role in cognition.

There is furthermore in these theories an overturning of any remaining structuralist suppositions (that language and meaning might be based on autonomous configurations of syntactic elements). Many cognitive scientists, in disagreement with Chomsky’s generative grammar, study meaning as a form of cognition that is activated in context of use. Lakoff and Johnson, in Philosophy in the Flesh, find a great deal of empirical evidence for the ways in which metaphors shape our ordinary experience, exploring the largely unconscious perceptual and linguistic processes that allow us to understand one idea or domain of experience, both conceptual and physical, in terms of a “foreign” domain. The research follows the work of Srini Narayanan and Eleanor Rosch, cognitive scientists who also examine schemas and metaphors as key in embodied theories of cognition. Such theories generally trace the connective interplay between our neuronal makeup, or physical interactions with the environment, and our own private and social human purposes.

In a limited sense, the stress on the embodied nature of cognition aligns itself with the phenomenological position. Perceptual systems, built in physical response to determinate spatio-temporal and linguistic contexts, become phenomenological “spaces” shaped through language use. Yet these researchers largely take issue with Continental phenomenology and traditional philosophy in a dramatic and far-reaching way, objecting to the claim that the phenomenological method of introspection makes adequate space for our ability to survey and describe all available fields of consciousness in the observing subject. If it is the case that we do not fully access the far reaches of hidden cognitive processes, much of the metaphorical mapping which underlies cognition takes place at an unconscious level, which is sometimes referred to as “the cognitive unconscious.”(PIF 12-15)

Other philosophers of mind, including Stefano Arduini, and Antonio D’Amasio, work along similar lines in cognitive linguistics, cognitive science, neuroscience, and artificial intelligence. Their work investigates the ways in which metaphors ground various first and second-order cognitive and emotional operations and functions. Their conclusions share insights with the Continental studies conceiving of metaphor as a “refiguring” of experience. There is then some potential for overlap with this cognitive-conceptual version of metaphor, where metaphors and schemata embody emergent transformative categories enabling the creation of new fields of cognition and meaning.

Arduini, in his work, has explored what he calls the “anthropological ability” to build up representations of the world. Here rhetorical figures are realized on the basis of conceptual domains which create the borders of experience. We have access to a kind of reality that would otherwise be indeterminate, for human beings have the ability to conceptualize the world in imaginative terms through myth, symbol, the unconscious, or any expressive sign. For Arduini, figurative activity does not depict the given world, but allows for the ability to construct world images employed in reality. To be figuratively competent is to use the imagination as a tool which puts patterns together in inventive mental processes. Arduini then seems to recall Nieztsche; anthropologically speaking, humans are always engaging in some form of figuration or form of language, which allows for “cognitive competence” in that it chooses among particular forms which serve to define the surrounding contexts or environments. Again, metaphor is foundational to the apprehension of reality; it is part of the pre-reflective or primordial apparatus of experience, perception, and first- through second-order thought, comprising an entire theoretical approach as well as disciplines such as evolutionary anthropology (see Tooby and Cosmides).

b. The Literary Mind

The work of Gilles Fauconnier and Mark Turner extends that of Lakoff and Johnson outlined above. For Fauconnier, the task of language is to construct, and for the linguist and cognitive scientist it is “a window into the mind.” Independently and together, Fauconnier and Turner’s collaboration results in a theory of conceptual blending in which metaphorical forms take center stage. Basically, the theory of conceptual blending follows from Lakoff and Johnson’s work on the “mapping” or projective qualities of our cognitive faculties. For example, if we return to take Shakespearean line “in me thou seest the glowing of such fire”, the source is fire, whose sets of associations are projected onto the target – in this case the waning aspect of the narrator. Their research shows that large numbers of such cross-domain mappings are expressed as conceptual structures which have propositional content: for example, “life is fire, loss is extinction of fire.” There exist several categories of mappings across different conceptual domains, including spatio-temporal orientation, movement, and containment. For example: “time flies” or “this relationship is smothering.”

Turner’s work in The Literary Mind, takes a slightly different route, portraying these cognitive mechanisms as forms of “storytelling.” This may, superficially, seem counterintuitive to the ordinary observer, but Turner gives ample evidence for the mind’s ability to do much of its everyday work using various forms of narrative projection (LM 6-9). It is not too far a reach from this version of narrative connection back to the hermeneutic and cognitive-conceptual uses of metaphor outlined earlier. If we understand parables to be essentially forms of extended metaphor, we can clearly see the various ways in which they contribute to the making of intelligible experience.

The study of these mental models sheds light on the phenomenological and hermeneutic aspects of reality-construction. If these heuristic models are necessary to cognitive functioning, it is because they allow us to represent higher-order aspects of reality which involve expressions of human agency, intentionality, and motivation. Though we may be largely unaware of these patterns, they are based on our ability to think in metaphor, are necessary, and are continuously working to enable the structuring of intentional experience – which cannot always be adequately represented by straightforward first-order physical description. Fauconnier states:

We see their status as inventions by contrasting them with alternative representations of the world. When we watch someone sitting down in a chair, we see what physics cannot recognize: an animate agent performing an intentional act. (MTL 19-20)

Turner, along with Fauconnier and Lakoff, connects parabolic thought with the image-schematic or mapping between different domains of encounter with our environments. Fauconnier’s work, correlating here with Turner’s, moves between cognitive-scientific and phenomenological considerations; both depict mapping as a constrained form of projection, a complex mental manipulation which moves across mental structures which correspond to various phenomenological spaces of thought, action, and communication.

Metaphorical mapping allows the mind to cross and conflate several domains of experience. The cross-referencing, reminiscent of Black’s interactionist dynamics, amounts to a form of induction resulting from projected relations between a source structure, a pattern we already understand, onto a target structure, that which we seek to understand.

Mapping as a form of metaphoric construction leads to other forms of blending, conceptual integration, and novel category formation. We can, along with Fauconnier and the rest, describe this emergent evolution of linguistic meaning in dialectical terms, arguing that it is possible to mesh together two images of virus (biological and computational) into a third integrated idea that integrates and expands the meaning of the first two (MTL 22). Philosophically speaking, we seem to have come full circle back to the Hegelian theme which runs through the phenomenological analysis of metaphor as a re-mapping of mind and reality.

7. Conclusion

The Continental theories of metaphor that have extrapolated and developed variations on the theme expressed in Nietzsche’s apocryphal pronouncement that truth is “a mobile army of metaphors.” The notion that metaphorical language is somehow ontologically and epistemologically prior to ordinary propositional language has since been voiced by Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida. For these thinkers metaphor serves as a foundational heuristic structure, one which is primarily designed to subvert ordinary reference and in some way dismantle the truth-bearing claims of first-order propositional language. Martin Heidegger’s existential phenomenology does away with the assumption that true or meaningful intentional statements reflect epistemic judgments about the world; that is, they do not derive referential efficacy through the assumed correspondence between an internal idea and an external object. While there may be a kind of agreement between our notions of things and the world in which we find those things, it is still a derivative agreement emerging from a deeper ontologically determined set of relations between things-in-the-world, given or presented to us as inherently linked together in particular historical, linguistic, or cultural contexts.

The role of metaphor in perception and cognition also dominates the work of contemporary cognitive scientists, linguists, and those working in the related fields of evolutionary anthropology and computational theory. While the latter may not be directly associated with Continental phenomenology, aspects of their work support an “anti-metaphysical” position and draw upon common phenomenological themes which stress the embodied, linguistic, contextual, and symbolic nature of knowledge. Thinkers and researchers in this camp argue that metaphoric schemas are integral to human reasoning and action, in that they allow us to develop our cognitive and heuristic capacities beyond simple and direct first order experience.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Categories and De Interpretatione. J.C. Ackrill, trans. Oxford, Clarendon, 1963. (CDI)
  • Aristotle. Peri Hermenenias. Hans Arens, trans. Philadelphia, Benjamins, 1984. (PH)
  • Arduini, Stefano (ed.). Metaphors. Edizioni Di Storia E Letteratura,
  • Barber, A. and Stainton, R. The Concise Encyclopedia of Language and Linguistics.
  • Oxford, Elsevier Ltd., 2010
  • Black, Max. Models and Metaphors. Ithaca, Cornell, 1962. (MAM)
  • Brentano, Franz C. On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle. Berkeley, UC Press, 1975.
  • Cazeaux, Clive. Metaphor and Continental Philosophy, from Kant to Derrida. London, Routledge, 2007.
  • Cooper, David E. Metaphor. London, Oxford, 1986.
  • Derrida, Jacques. “White Mythology, Metaphor in the Text of Philosophy” in Margins of Philosophy, trans. A. Bass, Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 1982. (WM)
  • Fauconnier, Gilles. Mappings in Thought and Language. Cambridge, Cambridge University, 1997. (MTL)
  • Gallagher, Shaun. Phenomenology and Non-reductionist Cognitive Science” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science. ed. by Shaun Gallagher and Daniel Schmicking. Springer, New York, 2010.
  • Goodman, Nelson. Languages of Art. New York, Bobs-Merrill, 1968.
  • Hinman, Lawrence. “Nietzsche, Metaphor, and Truth” in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 43, #2, 1984.
  • Harnad, Stevan. “Category Induction and Representation” in Categorical Perception: The Groundwork of Cognition. New York, Cambridge, 1987.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. John MacQuarrie and E. Robinson, trans. New York,
  • Harper and Row, 1962. (BT)
  • Heidegger, Martin. The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, trans. A. Hofstadter, Bloomington, Indiana University Press, 1982.
  • Huemer, Wolfgang. The Constitution of Consciousness: A Study in Analytic Phenomenology. Routledge, 2005.
  • Johnson, Mark. “Metaphor and Cognition” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science, ed. by Shaun Gallagher and Daniel Schmicking. Springer, New York, 2010.
  • Joy, Morny. “Derrida and Ricoeur: A Case of Mistaken Identity” in The Journal of Religion. Vol. 68, #04, University of Chicago Press, 1988.
  • Kant, Immanuel. The Critique of Pure Reason. Trans. N. K. Smith, New York, 1958. (CPR)
  • Kofman, Sarah, Nietzsche and Metaphor. Trans. D. Large, Stanford, 1993.
  • Lakoff, George and Johnson, Mark. Philosophy in the Flesh: The Embodied Mind and Its Challenge to Western Thought. New York, Perseus-Basic, 1999.
  • Malabou, Catharine. The Future of Hegel: Plasticity, Temporality, and the Dialectic. Trans. Lisabeth During, New York, Routledge, 2005.
  • Nietzsche, F. The Birth of Tragedy and the Case of Wagner. Trans. W. Kaufman. New York, Vintage, 1967. (BOT)
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Imagination and Chance: The Difference Between the Thought of Ricoeur and Derrida. Albany, SUNY Press, 1992
  • Mohanty, J.N. and McKenna, W.R. Husserl’s Phenomenology; A Textbook. Washington, DC, University Press, 1989.
  • Rajan, Tilottama. Deconstruction and the Remainders of Phenomenology: Sartre, Derrida, Foucault, Baudrillard. Stanford, Stanford University Press, 2002.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. Figuring the Sacred, trans. D. Pellauer, Minneapolis, Fortress, 1995. (FS)
  • Ricoeur, Paul. The Rule of Metaphor. Toronto, University of Toronto, 1993. (ROM)
  • Schrift Alan D. and Lawlor, Leonard (eds.) TheHistory of Continental Philosophy; Vol. 4 Phenomenology: Responses and Developments. Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 2010.
  • Stellardi, Giuseppe. Heidegger and Derrida on Philosophy and Metaphor: Imperfect Thought. New York, Humanity-Prometheus, 2000.
  • Tooby, J. and L. Cosmides (ed. with J.Barkow). The Adapted Mind: Evolutionary Psychology and The Generation of Culture. Oxford, 1992.
  • Turner, Mark. The Literary Mind: The Origins of Thought and Language. Oxford, 1996. (LM)
  • Woodruff-Smith, David and McIntyre, Ronald. Husserl and Intentionality: A Study of Mind, Meaning, and Language. Boston, 1982.
  • Zahavi, Dan. “Naturalized Phenomenology” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science.


Author Information

S. Theodorou
Immaculata University
U. S. A.

Differential Ontology

Differential ontology approaches the nature of identity by explicitly formulating a concept of difference as foundational and constitutive, rather than thinking of difference as merely an observable relation between entities, the identities of which are already established or known. Intuitively, we speak of difference in empirical terms, as though it is a contrast between two things; a way in which a thing, A, is not like another thing, B. To speak of difference in this colloquial way, however, requires that A and B each has its own self-contained nature, articulated (or at least articulable) on its own, apart from any other thing. The essentialist tradition, in contrast to the tradition of differential ontology, attempts to locate the identity of any given thing in some essential properties or self-contained identities, and it occupies, in one form or another, nearly all of the history of philosophy. Differential ontology, however, understands the identity of any given thing as constituted on the basis of the ever-changing nexus of relations in which it is found, and thus, identity is a secondary determination, while difference, or the constitutive relations that make up identities, is primary. Therefore, if philosophy wishes to adhere to its traditional, pre-Aristotelian project of arriving at the most basic, fundamental understanding of things, perhaps its target will need to be concepts not rooted in identity, but in difference.

“Differential ontology” is a term that may be applied particularly to the works and ideas of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze. Their successors have extended their work into cinema studies, ethics, theology, technology, politics, the arts, and animal ethics, among others.

This article consists of three main sections. The first explores a brief history of the problem. The historical emergence of the problem in ancient Greek philosophy reveals not only the dangers of a philosophy of difference, but also demonstrates that it is a philosophical problem that is central to the nature of philosophy as such, and is as old as philosophy itself. The second section explores some of the common themes and concerns of differential ontology. The third section discusses differential ontology through the specific lenses of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze.

Table of Contents

  1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy
    1. Heraclitus
    2. Parmenides
    3. Plato
    4. Aristotle
  2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology
    1. Immanence
    2. Time as Differential
    3. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics
  3. Key Differential Ontologists
    1. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist
    2. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Other Sources Cited in this Article

1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy

Although the concept of differential ontology is applied specifically to Derrida and Deleuze, the problem of difference is as old as philosophy itself. Its precursors lie in the philosophies of Heraclitus and Parmenides, it is made explicit in Plato and deliberately shut down in Aristotle, remaining so for some two and a half millennia before being raised again, and turned into an explicit object of thought, by Derrida and Deleuze in the middle of the twentieth century.

a. Heraclitus

From its earliest beginnings, what distinguishes ancient Greek philosophy from a mythologically oriented worldview is philosophy’s attempt to offer a rationally unified picture of the operations of the universe, rather than a cosmos subject to the fleeting and conflicting whims of various deities, differing from humans only in virtue of their power and immortality. The early Milesian philosophers, for instance, had each sought to locate among the various primitive elements a first principle (or archê). Thales had argued that water was the primary principle of all things, while Anaximenes had argued for air. Through various processes and permutations (or in the case of Anaximenes, rarefaction and condensation), this first principle assumes the forms of the various other elements with which we are familiar, and of which the cosmos is comprised. All things come from this primary principle, and eventually, they return to it.

Against such thinkers, Heraclitus of Ephesus (fl. c.500 BCE) argues that fire is the first principle of the cosmos: “The cosmos, the same for all, no god or man made, but it always was, is, and will be, an everlasting fire, being kindled in measures and put out in measures.” (DK22B30) From this passage, we are able to glean a few things. The most obvious divergence is that Heraclitus names fire as the basic element, rather than water, air, or, in the case of Anaximander, the boundless (apeiron). But secondly, unlike the Milesians, Heraclitus does not hold in favor of any would-be origin of the cosmos. The universe always was and always will be this self-manifesting, self-quenching, primordial fire, expressed in nature’s limitless ways. So while fire, for Heraclitus, may be ontologically basic in some sense, it is not temporally basic or primordial: it did not, in the temporal or sequential order of things, come first.

However, like his Milesian predecessors, Heraclitus appears to provide at least a basic account for how fire as first principle transforms: “The turnings of fire: first sea, and of sea, half is earth, half lightning flash.” (DK22B31a) Elsewhere we can see more clearly that fire has ontological priority only in a very limited sense for Heraclitus: “The death of earth is to become water, and the death of water is to become air, and the death of air is to become fire, and reversely.” (DK22B76) Earth becomes water; water becomes air; air becomes fire, and reversely. Combined with the two passages above, we can see that the ontological priority of fire is its transformative power. Fire from the sky consumes water, which later falls from the sky nourishing the earth. Likewise, fire underlies water (which in its greatest accumulations rages and howls as violently as flame itself), out of which comes earth and the meteorological or ethereal activity itself. Thus we can see the greatest point of divergence between Heraclitus and his Milesian forbears: the first principle of Heraclitus is not a substance. Fire, though one of the classical elements, is of its very nature a dynamic element—a vital element that is nothing more than its own transformation. It creates (volcanoes produce land masses; furnaces temper steel; heat cooks our food and keeps us safe from elemental exposure), but it also destroys in countless obvious ways; it hardens and strengthens, just as it weakens and consumes. Fire, then, is not an element in the sense of a thing, but more as a process. In contemporary scientific terms, we would say that it is the result of a chemical reaction, its essence for Heraclitus lies in its obvious dynamism. When we look at things (like tables, trees, homes, people, and so forth), they seem to exemplify a permanence which is saliently missing from our experience of fire.

This brings us to the next point: things, for Heraclitus, only appear to have permanence; or rather, their permanence is a result of the processes that make up the identities of the things in question. Here it is appropriate to cite the famous river example, found in more than one Heraclitean fragment: “You cannot step twice into the same rivers; for fresh waters are flowing in upon you.” (DK22B12) “We step and do not step into the same rivers; we are and are not.” (DK22B49a) These passages highlight the seemingly paradoxical nature of the cosmos. On the one hand, of course there is a meaningful sense in which one may step twice into the same river; one may wade in, wade back out, then walk back in again; this body of water is marked between the same banks, the same land markers, and the same flow of water, and so forth. But therein lies the paradox: the water that one waded into the first time is now completely gone, having been replaced by an entirely new configuration of particles of water. So there is also a meaningful sense in which one cannot step into the same river twice. But it is this particular flowing that makes this river this river, and nothing else. Its identity, therefore (as also my own identity), is an effervescent impermanence, constituted on the basis of the flows that make it up. We peer into nature and see things—rivers, people, animals, and so forth—but these are only temporary constitutions, even deceptions: “Men are deceived in their knowledge of things that are manifest.” (DK22B56) The true nature of nature itself, however, continuously eludes us: “Nature tends to conceal itself.” (DK22B123)

The paradoxical nature of things, (that their identities are constituted on the basis of processes), helps us to make sense of Heraclitus’ proclamation of the unity of opposites, (which both Plato and Aristotle held to be unacceptable). Fire is vital and powerful, raging beneath the appearances of nature like a primordial ontological state of warfare: “War is the father of all and the king of all.” (DK22B53) The very same process-driven nature of things that makes a thing what it is by the same operations tends toward the thing’s undoing as well. As we saw, fire is responsible for the opposite and complementary functions of both creativity and destruction. The nature of things is to tend toward their own undoing and eventual passage into their opposites: “What opposes unites, and the finest attunement stems from things bearing in opposite directions, and all things come about by strife.” (DK22B8).

It is in this sense that all things are, for Heraclitus, one. The creative-destructive operations of nature underlie all of its various expressions, binding the whole of the cosmos together in accordance with a rational principle of organization, recognized only in the universal and timeless truth that everything is constantly subject to the law of flux and impermanence: “It is wise to hearken, not to me, but to the Word [logos—otherwise translatable as reason, argument, rational principle, and so forth], and to confess that all things are one.” (DK22B50). Thus it is that Heraclitus is known as the great thinker of becoming or flux. The being of the cosmos, the most essential fact of its nature, lies in its becoming; its only permanence is its impermanence. For our purposes, we can say that Heraclitus was the first philosopher of difference. Where his predecessors had sought to identify the one primordial, self-identical substance or element, out of which all others had emerged, Heraclitus had attempted to think the world, nothing more than the world, in a permanent state (if this is not too paradoxical) of flux.

b. Parmenides

Parmenides (b. 510 BCE) was likely a young man at the time when Heraclitus was philosophically active. Born in Elea, in Lower Italy, Parmenides’ name is the one most commonly associated with Eleatic monism. While (ironically) there is no one standard interpretation of Eleatic monism, probably the most common understanding of Parmenides is filtered through our familiarity with the paradoxes of his successor, Zeno, who argued, in defense of Parmenides, that what we humans perceive as motion and change are mere illusions.

Against this backdrop, what we know of Parmenides’ views come to us from his didactic poem, titled On Nature, which now exists in only fragmentary form. Here, however, we find Parmenides, almost explicitly objecting to Heraclitus: “It is necessary to say and to think that being is; for it is to be/but it is by no means nothing. These things I bid you ponder./For from this first path of inquiry, I bar you./then yet again from that along which mortals who know nothing/wander two-headed: for haplessness in their/breasts directs wandering understanding. They are borne along/deaf and blind at once, bedazzled, undiscriminating hordes,/who have supposed that being and not-being are the same/and not the same; but the path of all is back-turning.” (DK28B6) There are a couple of important things to note here. First, the mention of those who suppose that being and not-being are the same and not the same hearkens almost explicitly to Heraclitus’ notion of the unity of opposites. Secondly, Parmenides declares this to be the opinion of the undiscriminating hordes, the masses of non-philosophically-minded mortals.

Therefore, Heraclitus, on Parmenides’ view, does not provide a philosophical account of being; rather, he simply coats in philosophical language the everyday experience of the mob. Against Heraclitus’ critical diagnosis that humans (deceptively) see only permanent things, Parmenides claims that permanence is precisely what most people, Heraclitus included, miss, preoccupied as we are with the mundane comings and goings of the latest trends, fashions, and political currents. The being of the cosmos lies not in its becoming, as Heraclitus thought. Becoming is nothing more than an illusion, the perceptions of mortal minds. What is, for Parmenides, is and cannot not be, while what is not, is not, and cannot be. Neither is it possible to even think of what is not, for to think of anything entails that it must be an object of thought. Thus to meditate on something that is not an object is, for Parmenides, contradictory. Therefore, “for the same thing is for thinking and for being.” (DK28B3)

Being is indivisible; for in order to divide being from itself, one would have to separate being from being by way of something else, either being or not-being. But not-being is not and cannot be, (so not-being cannot separate being from being). And if being is separated from being by way of being, then being itself in this thought-experiment is continuous, that is to say, being is undivided (and indivisible): “for you will not sever being from holding to being.” (DK28B4.2) Being is eternal and unchanging; for if being were to change or become in any way, this would entail that in some sense it had participated or would participate in not-being which is impossible: “How could being perish? How could it come to be?/For if it came to be, it was not, nor if it is ever about to come to be./In this way becoming has been extinguished and destruction is not heard of.” (DK28B8.19-21)

Being, for Parmenides, is thus eternal, unchanging, and indivisible spatially or temporally. Heraclitus might have been right to note the way things appear, (as a constant state of becoming) but he was wrong, on Parmenides’ view, to confuse the way things appear with the way things actually are, or with the “steadfast heart of persuasive truth.” (DK28B1.29) Likewise, Parmenides has argued, thought can only genuinely attend to being—what is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible. Whatever it is that Heraclitus has found in the world of impermanence, it is not, Parmenides holds, philosophy. While unenlightened mortals may attend to the transience of everyday life, the path of genuine wisdom lies in the eternal and unchanging. Thus, while Heraclitus had been the first philosopher of difference, Parmenides is the first to assert explicitly that self-identity, and not difference, is the basis of philosophical thought.

c. Plato

It is these two accounts, the Heraclitean and the Parmenidean (with an emphatic privileging of the latter), that Plato attempts to answer and fuse in his theory of forms. Throughout Plato’s Dialogues, he consistently gives credence to the Heraclitean observation that things in the material world are in a constant state of flux. The Parmenidean inspiration in Plato’s philosophy, however, lies in the fact that, like Parmenides, Plato will explicitly assert that genuine knowledge must concern itself only with that which is eternal and unchanging. So, given the transient nature of material things, Plato will hold that knowledge, strictly speaking, does not apply to material things specifically, but rather, to the Forms (eternal and unchanging) of which those material things are instantiations. In Book V of the Republic, Plato (through Socrates) argues that each human capacity has a matter that is proper exclusively to it. For example, the capacity of seeing has as its proper matter waves of light, while the capacity of hearing has as its proper matter waves of sound. In a proclamation that hearkens almost explicitly to Parmenides, knowledge, Socrates argues, concerns itself with being, while ignorance is most properly affiliated with not-being.

From here, the account continues, (with an eye toward Heraclitus). Everything that exists in the world participates both in being and in not-being. For example, every circle both is and is not “circle.” It is a circle to the extent that we recognize its resemblance, but it is not circle (or the absolute embodiment of what it means to be a circle) because we also recognize that no circle as manifested in the world is a perfect circle. Even the most circular circle in the world will possess minor imperfections, however slight, that will make it not a perfect circle. Thus the things in the world participate both in being and in not-being. (This is the nature of becoming). Since being and not-being each has a specific capacity proper to it, becoming, lying between these two, must have a capacity that is proper only to it. This capacity, he argues, is opinion, which, as is fitting, is that epistemological mode or comportment lying somewhere between knowledge and ignorance.

Therefore, when one’s attention is turned only to the things of the world, she can possess only opinions regarding them. Knowledge, reserved only for that domain of being, that which is and cannot not be, for Plato, applies only to the Form of the thing, or what it means to be x and nothing but x. This Form is an eternal and unchanging reality. If one has knowledge of the Form, then one can evaluate each particular in the world, in order to accurately determine whether or not it in fact accords with the principle in question. If not, one may only have opinions about the thing. For example, if one possesses knowledge of the Form of the beautiful, then one may evaluate particular things in the world—paintings, sculptures, bodies, and so forth—and know whether or not they are in fact beautiful. Lacking this knowledge, however, one may hold opinions as to whether or not a given thing is beautiful, but one will never have genuine knowledge of it. More likely, she will merely possess certain tastes on the matter—(I like this poem; I do not like that painting, and so forth.) This is why Socrates, especially in the earlier dialogues, is adamant that his interlocutors not give him examples in order to define or explain their concepts (a pious action is doing what I am doing now...). Examples, he argues, can never tell me what the Form of the thing is, (such as piety, in the Euthyphro). The philosopher, Plato holds, concerns himself with being, or the essentiality of the Form, as opposed to the lover of opinion, who concerns himself only with the fleeting and impermanent.

From this point, however, things in the Platonic account start to get more complicated. “Participation” is itself a somewhat messy notion that Plato never quite explains in any satisfactory way. After all, what does it mean to say, as Socrates argues in the Republic, that the ring finger participates in the form of the large when compared to the pinky, and in the form of the small when compared to the middle finger? It would seem to imply that a thing’s participation in its relevant Form derives, not from anything specific about its nature, but only insofar as its nature is related to the nature of another thing. But the story gets even more complicated in that at multiple points in his later dialogues, Plato argues explicitly for a Form of the different, which complicates what we typically call Platonism, almost beyond the point of recognition, (see, for example, Theaetetus 186a; Parmenides 143b, 146b, and 153a; and Sophist 254e, 257b, and 259a).

On its face, this should not be surprising. If a finger sometimes participates in the form of the large and sometimes in the form of the small, it should stand to reason that any given thing, when looked at side by side with something similar, will be said to participate in the form of the same, while by extension, when compared to something that differs in nature, will be said to participate in the form of the different—and participate more greatly in the form of the different, the more different the two things are. A baseball, side by side with a softball, will participate greatly in the form of the same, (but somewhat in the Form of the different), but when looked at side by side with a cardboard box, will participate more in the Form of the different.

But consistently articulating what a Form of the different would be is more complicated than it may at first seem. To say that the Form of x is what it means to be x and nothing but x is comprehensible enough, when one is dealing with an isolable characteristic or set of characteristics of a thing. If we say, for instance, that the Form of circle is what it means to be a circle and nothing but a circle, we know that we mean all of the essential characteristics that make a circle, a circle, (a round-plane figure the boundary of which consists of points, equidistant from a center; an arc of 360°, and so forth.). By implication, each individual Form, to the extent that it completely is what it is, also participates equally in the Form of the same, in that it is the same as itself, or it is self-identical. But what can it possibly mean to say that the form of the different is what it means to be different and nothing but different? It would seem to imply that the identity of the form of the different is that it differs, but this requires that it differs even from itself. For if the essence of the different is that it is the same as the different, (in the way that the essence of circle is self-identical to what it means to be circle), then this would entail that the essence of the Form of the different is that, to the same extent that it is different, it participates equally in the Form of the same, (or that, like the rest of the Forms, it is self-identical). But the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same; it must bear nothing of the Form of the same. But this means that the Form of the different must be different from the different as well; put otherwise, while for every other conceivable Platonic Form, one can say that it is self-identical, the Form of the different would be absolutely unique in that its nature would be defined by its self-differentiation.

But there are further complications still. Each Form in Plato’s ontology must relate to every other Form by way of the Form of the different. From this it follows that, just as the Form of the same pervades all the other Forms, (in that each is identical to itself), the Form of the different also pervades all the other Forms, (in that each Form is different from every other). This implies, in some sense, that the different is co-constitutive, along with Plato’s Form of the same, of each other individual Form. After all, part of what makes a thing what it is, (and hence, self-same, or self-identical), is that it differs from everything that it is not. To the extent that the Form of the same makes any given Form what it is, it is commensurably different from every other Form that it is not.

This complication, however, reaches its apogee when we consider the Form of the same specifically. As we said, the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same. The Form of the same differs from all other Forms as well. While, for instance, the Form of the beautiful participates in the Form of the same, (in that the beautiful is the same as the beautiful, or it is self-identical), nevertheless, the Form of the same is different from, (that is, it is not the same as) the Form of the beautiful. The Form of the same differs, similarly, from all other Forms. However, its difference from the Form of the different is a special relation. If the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same, we can say reciprocally, that the Form of the same is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the different; it relates to the different through the different. But this means that, to the extent that the Form of the same is self-same, or self-identical, it is so because it differs absolutely from the Form of the different. This entails, however, that its self-sameness derives from its maximal participation in the Form of the different itself.

We see, then, the danger posed by Plato’s Form of the different, and hence, by any attempt to formulate a concept of difference itself. Plato’s Form of the same is ubiquitous throughout his ontology; it is, in a certain sense, the glue that holds together the rest of the Forms, even if in many of his Middle Period dialogues, it never makes an explicit appearance. Simply by understanding what a Form means for Plato, we can see the central role that the Form of the same plays for this, or for that matter, any other essentialist ontology. By simply introducing a Form of the different, and attempting to rigorously think through its implications, one can see that it threatens to fundamentally undermine the Form of the same itself, and hence by implication, difference threatens to devour the whole rest of the ontological edifice of essentialism. Plato, it seems, was playing with Heraclitean fire. It is likely largely for this reason that Aristotle, Plato’s greatest student, nixes the Form of the different in his Metaphysics.

d. Aristotle

In the Metaphysics, Aristotle attempts to correct what he perceives to be many of Plato’s missteps. For our purposes, what is most important is his treatment of the notion of difference. For Aristotle inserts into the discussion a presupposition that Plato had not employed, namely, that ‘difference’ may be said only of things which are, in some higher sense, identical. Where Plato’s Form of the different may be said to relate everything to everything else, Aristotle argues that there is a conceptual distinction to be made between difference and otherness.

For Aristotle, there are various ways in which a thing may be said to be one, in terms of: (1) Continuity; (2) Wholeness or unity; (3) Number; (4) Kind. The first two are a bit tricky to distinguish, even for Aristotle. By continuity, he means the general sense in which a thing may be said to be a thing. A bundle of sticks, bound together with twine, may be said to be one, even if it is a result of human effort that has made it so. Likewise, an individual body part, such as an arm or leg, may be said to be one, as it has an isolable functional continuity. Within this grouping, there are greater and lesser degrees to which something may be said to be one. For instance, while a human leg may be said to be one, the tibia or the femur, on their own, are more continuous, (in that each is numerically one, and the two of them together form the leg).

With respect to wholeness or unity, Aristotle clarifies the meaning of this as not differing in terms of substratum. Each of the parts of a man, (the legs, the arms, the torso, the head), may be said to be, in their own way, continuous, but taken together, and in harmonious functioning, they constitute the oneness or the wholeness of the individual man and his biological and psychological life. In this sense, the man is one, in that all of his parts function naturally together towards common ends. In the same respect, a shoelace, each eyelet, the sole, and the material comprising the shoe itself, may be said to be, each in their own way, continuous, while taken together, they constitute the wholeness of the shoe.

Oneness in number is fairly straightforward. A man is one in the organic sense above, but he is also one numerically, in that his living body constitutes one man, as opposed to many men. Finally, there is generic oneness, the oneness in kind or in intelligibility. There is a sense in which all human beings, taken together, may be said to be one, in that they are all particular tokens of the genus human. Likewise, humans, cats, dogs, lions, horses, pigs, and so forth, may all be said to be one, in that they are all types of the genus animal.

Otherness is the term that Aristotle uses to characterize existent things which are, in any sense of the term, not one. There is, as we said, a sense in which a horse and a woman are one, (in that both are types of the genus animal), but an obvious sense in which they are other as well. There is a sense in which my neighbor and I are one, (in that we are both tokens of the genus human), but insofar as we are materially, emotionally, and psychologically distinct, there is a sense in which I am other than my neighbor as well. There is an obvious sense in which I and my leg are one but there is also a sense in which my leg is other than me as well, (for if I were to lose my leg in an accident, provided I received prompt and proper medical attention, I would continue to exist). Every existent thing, Aristotle argues, is by its very nature either one with or other than every other existent thing.

But this otherness does not, (as it does for Plato’s Form of the different), satisfy the conditions for what Aristotle understands as difference. Since everything that exists is either one with or other than everything else that exists, there need not be any definite sense in which two things are other. Indeed, there may be, (as we saw above, my neighbor and I are one in the sense of tokens of the genus human, but are other numerically), but there need not be. For instance, you are so drastically other than a given place, say, a cornfield, that we need not even enumerate the various ways in which the two of you are other.

This, however, is the key for Aristotle: otherness is not the same as difference. While you are other than a particular cornfield, you are not different than a cornfield. Difference, strictly speaking, applies only when there is some definite sense in which two things may be said to differ, which requires a higher category of identity within which a distinction may be drawn: “For the other and that which it is other than need not be other in some definite respect (for everything that is existent is either other or same), but that which is different is different from some particular thing in some particular respect, so that there must be something identical whereby they differ. And this identical thing is genus or species...” (Metaphysics, X.3) In other words, two human beings may be different, (that is, one may be taller, lighter-skinned, a different gender, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specific members of the genus ‘human.’ A human being may be different than a cat, (that is, one is quadripedal while the other is bipedal, one is non-rational while the other is rational, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specified members of the genus ‘animal.’

But between these two, generic and specific, specific difference or contrariety is, according to Aristotle, the greatest, most perfect, or most complete. This assessment too is rooted in Aristotle’s emphasis on identity as the basis of differentiation. Differing in genus in Aristotelian terminology means primarily belonging to different categories of being, (substance, time, quality, quantity, place, relation, and so forth.) You are other than ‘5,’ to be sure, but Aristotle would not say that you are different from ‘5,’ because you are a substance and ‘5’ is a quantity and given that these two are distinct categories of being, for Aristotle there is not really a meaningful sense in which they can be said to relate, and hence, there is not a meaningful sense in which they can be said to differ. Things that differ in genus are so far distant (closer, really, to otherness), as to be nearly incomparable. However, a man may be said to be different than a cat, because the characteristics whereby they are distinguished from each other are contrarieties, occupying opposing sides of a given either/or, for instance, rational v. non-rational. Special difference or contrariety thus provides us with an affirmation or a privation, a ‘yes’ or a ‘no’ that constitutes the greatest difference, according to Aristotle. Differences in genus are too great, while differences within species are too minute and numerous (skin color, for instance, is manifested in an infinite myriad of ways), but special contrariety is complete, embodying an affirmation or negation of a particular given quality whereby genera are differentiated into species.

There are thus two senses in which, for Aristotle, difference is thought only in accordance with a principle of identity. First, there is the identity that two different things share within a common genus. (A rock and a tree are identical in that both are members of the genus, ‘substance,’ differentiated by the contrariety of ‘living/non-living.’) Second, there is the identity of the characteristic whereby two things are differentiated: material (v. non-material), living (v. non-living), sentient (v. non-sentient), rational (v. irrational), and so forth.

We see, then, that with Aristotle, difference becomes fully codified within the tradition as the type of empirical difference that we mentioned at the outset of this article: it is understood as a recognizable relation between two things which, prior to (and independently of) their relating, possess their own self-contained identities. This difference then is a way in which a thing A, (which is identical to itself) is not like a thing B (which is identical to itself), while both belong to a higher category of identity, (in the sense of an Aristotelian genus). Given the difficulties that we encountered with Plato’s attempt to think a Form of the different, it is perhaps little wonder that Aristotle’s understanding of difference was left unchallenged for nearly two and a half millennia.

2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology

As noted in the Introduction, differential ontology is a term that can be applied to two specific thinkers (Deleuze and Derrida) of the late twentieth century, along with those philosophers who have followed in the wakes of these two. It is, nonetheless, not applicable as a school of thought, in that there is not an identifiable doctrine or set of doctrines that define what they think. Indeed, for as many similarities that one can find between them, there are likely equally many distinctions as well. They work out of different philosophical traditions: Derrida primarily from the Hegel-Husserl-Heidegger triumvirate, with Deleuze, (speaking critically of the phenomenological tradition for the most part) focusing on the trinity of Spinoza-Nietzsche-Bergson. Theologically, they are interested in different sources, with Derrida giving constant nods to thinkers in the tradition of negative theology, such as Meister Eckhart, while Deleuze is interested in the tradition of univocity, specifically in John Duns Scotus. They have different attitudes toward the history of metaphysics, with Derrida working out of the Heideggerian platform of the supposed end of metaphysics, while Deleuze explicitly rejects all talk of any supposed end of metaphysics. They hold different attitudes toward their own philosophical projects, with Derrida coining the term, (following Heidegger’s Destruktion), deconstruction, while for Deleuze, philosophy is always a constructivism. In many ways, it is difficult to find two thinkers who are less alike than Deleuze and Derrida. Nevertheless, what makes them both differential ontologists is that they are working within a framework of specific thematic critiques and assumptions, and that on the basis of these factors, both come to argue that difference in itself has never been recognized as a legitimate object of philosophical thought, to hold that identities are always constituted, on the basis of difference in itself, and to explicitly attempt to formulate such a concept. Let us now look to these thematic, structural elements.

a. Immanence

The word immanence is contrasted with the word transcendence. “Transcendence” means going beyond, while “immanence” means remaining within, and these designations refer to the realm of experience. In most monotheistic religious traditions, for instance, which emphasize creation ex nihilo, God is said to be transcendent in the sense that He exists apart from His creation. God is the source of nature, but God is not, Himself, natural, nor is he found within anything in nature except perhaps in the way in which one might see reflections of an artist in her work of art. Likewise God does not, strictly speaking, resemble any created thing. God is eternal, while created beings are temporal; God is without beginning, while created things have a beginning; God is a necessary being, while created things are contingent beings; God is pure spirit, while created things are material. The creature closest in nature to God is the human being who, according to the Biblical book of Genesis, is created in the image of God, but even in this case, God is not to be understood as resembling human beings: “For my thoughts are not your thoughts, neither are my ways your ways...” (Isaiah 55:8).

In this sense, we can say that historically, the trend in Eastern philosophies and religions (which are not as radically differentiated as they are in the Western tradition), has always leaned much more in the direction of immanence than of transcendence, and definitely more so than nearly all strains of Western monotheism. In schools of Eastern philosophy that have some notion of the divine (and a great many of them do not), many if not most understand the divine as somehow embodied or manifested within the world of nature. Such a position would be considered idolatrous in most strains of Western monotheism.

With respect to the Western philosophical tradition specifically, we can say that, even in moments when religious tendencies and doctrines do not loom large, (like they do, for instance, during the Medieval period), there nevertheless remains a dominant model of transcendence throughout, though this transcendence is emphasized in greater and lesser degrees across the history of philosophy. There have been outliers, to be sure—Heraclitus comes to mind, along with Spinoza and perhaps David Hume, but they are rare. A philosophy rooted in transcendence will, in some way, attempt to ground or evaluate life and the world on the basis of principles or criteria not found (indeed not discoverable de jure) among the living or in the world. When Parmenides asserts that the object of philosophical thought must be that which is, and which cannot not be, which is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible, he is describing something beyond the realm of experience. When Plato claims that genuine knowledge is found only in the Form; when he argues in the Phaedo that the philosophical life is a preparation for death; that one must live one’s life turning away from the desires of the body, in the purification of the spirit; when he alludes, (through the mouth of Socrates) to life as a disease, he is basing the value of this world on a principle not found in the world. When St. Paul writes that “...the flesh lusts against the Spirit, and the Spirit against the flesh; and these are contrary to one another, so that you do not do the things you wish” (Galatians 5:17), and that “the mind governed by the flesh is death,” (Romans 8:6), he is evaluating this world against another. When René Descartes recognizes his activity of thinking and finds therein a soul; when John Locke bases Ideas upon a foundation of primary qualities, immanent, allegedly, to the thing, but transcendent to our experience; when Immanuel Kant bases phenomenal appearances upon noumenal realities, which, outside of space, time, and all causality, ever elude cognition; when an ethical thinker seeks a moral law, or an absolute principle of the good against which human behaviors may be evaluated; in each of these cases, a transcendence of some sort is posited—something not found within the world is sought in order to make sense of or provide a justification for this world.

Famously, Friedrich Nietzsche argued that the history of philosophy was one of the true world finally becoming a fable. Tracing the notion of the true world from its sagely Platonic (more accurately, Parmenidean) inception up through and beyond its Kantian (noumenal) manifestation, he demonstrates that as the demand for certainty (the will to Truth) intensifies, the so-called true world becomes less plausible, slipping further and further away, culminating in the moment he called “the death of God.” The true world has now been abolished, leaving only the apparent world. But the world was only ever called apparent by comparison with a purported true world (think here of Parmenides’ castigation of Heraclitus). Thus, when the true world is abolished, the apparent world is abolished as well; and we are left with only the world, nothing more than the world.

One of the key features of differential ontology will be the adoption of Nietzsche’s proclaimed (and reclaimed) enthusiasm for immanence. Deleuze and Derrida will, each in his own way, argue that philosophy must find its basis within and take as its point of departure the notion of immanence. As we shall see below, in Deleuze’s philosophy, this emphasis on immanence will take the form of his enthusiasm for the Scotist doctrine of the univocity of being. For Derrida, it will be his lifelong commitment to the phenomenological tradition, inspired by the vast body of research conducted over nearly half a century by Edmund Husserl, out of which Derrida’s professional research platform began, (and in which he discovers the notion of différance).

b. Time as Differential

Related to the privileging of immanence is the second principle of central importance to differential ontology, a careful and rigorous analysis of time. Such analysis, inspired by Edmund Husserl, will yield the discovery of a differential structure, which stands in opposition to the traditional understanding of time, the spatially organized, puncti-linear model of time. This refers to a conglomeration of various elements from Plato, Aristotle, St. Augustine, Boethius, and ultimately, the Modern period.

Few thinkers have attempted so rigorously as Aristotle to think the paradoxical nature of time. If we take the very basic model of time as past-present-future, Aristotle notes that one part of this (the past), has been but is no more, while another part of it (the future) will be but is not yet. There is an inherent difficulty, therefore, in trying to understand what time is, because it seems as though it is composed of parts made up of things that do not exist; therefore, we are attempting to understand what something that does not exist, is.

Furthermore, the present or the now itself, for Aristotle, is not a part of time, because a part is so called because of its being a constitutive element of a whole. However, time, Aristotle claims, is not made up of nows, in the same way that a line, though it has points, is not made up of points.

Likewise, the now cannot simply remain the same, but nor can it be said to be discrete from other nows and ever-renewed. For if the now is ever the same, then everything that has ever happened is contained within the present now, (which seems absurd); but if each now is discrete, and is constantly displaced by another discrete, self-contained now, the displacement of the old now would have to take place within (or simultaneously with) the new, incoming now, which would be impossible, as discrete nows cannot be simultaneous; hence time as such would never pass.

Aristotle will therefore claim that there is a sense in which the now is constantly the same, and another sense in which it is constantly changing. The now is, Aristotle argues, both a link of and the limit between future and past. It connects future and past, but is at the same time the end of the past and the beginning of the future; but the future and the past lie on opposite sides of the now, so the now cannot, strictly speaking, belong either to the past or to the future. Rather, it divides the past from the future. The essence of the now is this division—as such, the now itself is indivisible, “the indivisible present ‘now’.” (Physics IV.13). Insofar as each now succeeds another in a linear movement from future to past, the now is ever-changing—what is predicated of the now is constantly filled out in an ever-new way. But structurally speaking, inasmuch as the now is always that which divides and unites future and past, it is constantly the same.

Without the now, there would be no time, Aristotle argues, and vice versa. For what we call time is merely the enumeration that takes place in the progression of history between some moment, future or past, relative to the now moment: “For time is just this—number of motion in respect of ‘before’ and ‘after’.” (Physics, IV.11)

Here, then, are the elements that Aristotle leaves us with: an indivisible now moment that serves as the basis of the measure of time, which is a progression of enumeration taking place between moments, and a notion of relative distance that marks that progression of enumeration.

In Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius, we find an important distinction between time and eternity: (it is important to note that Aristotle’s discussion of time is found in his Physics, not in his Metaphysics, because time, as the measure of change, belongs only to the things of nature, not to the divine). The reason that this is an important distinction for our purposes is that eternity, (for Plato, Augustine, and Boethius), is the perspective of the divine, while temporality is the perspective of creation. Eternity, for all three of these thinkers, does not mean passing through every moment of time in the sense of having always been there, and always being there throughout every moment of the future, (which is called ‘sempiternity’). All three of these philosophers view time as itself a created thing, and eternity, the perspective of the divine, stands outside of time.

Having created the entire spectrum of time, and standing omnisciently outside of time, the divine sees the whole of time, in an ever-present now. This complete fullness of the now is how Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius understand eternity. Once we have made this move, however, it is a very short leap to the conclusion that, in a sense, all of time is ever-present; certainly not from our perspective, but from the perspective of the divine. In other words, right now, in an ever-present now, God is seeing the exodus of the Israelites, the sacking of Troy, the execution of Socrates, the crucifixion of Jesus, the fall of the Roman Empire, and the moment (billions of years from now) that the sun will become a Red Giant. Therefore, what we call the now is, on this model, no more or less significant, and no more or less NOW, than any other moment in time. It only appears to be so, from our very limited, finite perspectives. From the perspective of eternity, however, each present is equally present. Plato refers to time in the Timaeus as a “moving image of eternity.” (Timaeus, 37d)

The final piece of the puncti-linear model of time comes from the historical moment of the scientific revolution, with the conceptual birth of absolute time. On the Modern view, time is not the Aristotelian measure of change; rather, the measure of change is how we typically perceive time. Time, in and of itself, however, just is, in the same way that space, on the Modern view, just is—it is mathematical, objectively uniform and unitary, and the same in all places, its units (or moments) unfolding with precise regularity. Though the term “absolute time” was officially introduced by Sir Isaac Newton in his Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica (1687), as that which “from its own nature flows equably without regard to anything external,” it is nevertheless clear that the experiments and theories of both Johannes Kepler and Galileo Galilei (both of whom historically preceded Newton) assume a model of absolute time. None other than René Descartes, the philosopher who did more than any other to usher in the modern sciences, writes in the third of his famous Meditations on First Philosophy, (where he argues for the existence of God) “for the whole time of my life may be divided into an infinity of parts, each of which is in no way dependent on any other...”

The puncti-linear model of time, then, conceives the whole of time as a series of now-points, or moments, each of which makes up something like an atom of time (as the physical atom is a unit of space). Each of those moments is ontologically and logically independent of every other, with the present moment being the now-point most alive. The past, then, is conceived as those presents that have come and gone, while the future is conceived as those presents that have not yet come, and insofar as we speak of past and future moments as occupying points of greater and lesser distances with respect to the present and to each other as well, we are, whether we realize it or not, conceiving of time as a linear progression; thus when we attempt to understand the essence of time, we tend to conceptually spatialize it. This prejudice is most easily seen in the ease with which our mind leaps to timelines in order to conceptualize relations of historical events.

Edmund Husserl, whose 1904-1905 lectures On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time probably did more to shape the future of the continental tradition in philosophy in the twentieth century than any other single text, was also very influential on the issue of time consciousness. There, Husserl constructs a model of time consciousness that he calls “the living present.” Whether or not there is any such thing as real time, or absolute time is, for Husserl, one of those questions that is bracketed in the performance of the phenomenological epochē; time, for Husserl, as everything else, is to be analyzed in terms of its objective qualities, in other words, in terms of how it is lived by a constituting subject. Husserl’s point of departure is to object to the theory of experience offered by Husserl’s mentor, Franz Brentano. Assuming (though not making explicit) the puncti-linear model of time, Brentano distinguishes between two basic types of experience. The primary mode is perception, which is the consciousness of the present now-point. All modes of the past are understood in terms of memory, which is the imagined recollection or representation of a now-moment no longer present. If you are asked to call to mind your celebration of your tenth birthday, you are employing the faculty of memory. And every mode of experience dealing with the past (or the no-longer-present), is understood by Brentano as memory.

This understanding presents a problem, though. From the moment you began reading the first word of this sentence, from, until this moment right now, as you are reading these words, there is a type of memory being employed. Indeed, in order to genuinely experience any given experience as an experience, and not just a random series of moments, there must be some operation of memory taking place. To cognize a song as a song, rather than a random series of notes, we must have some memory of the notes that have come just before, and so on. However, the type of memory that is being used here seems to be qualitatively different than the sort of memory employed when you are encouraged to reflect upon your tenth birthday, or even, to reflect upon what you had for dinner last night. This type of reflection, (or representation) is a calling-back-to-mind of an event that was experienced at some point in the past, but has long since left consciousness, while the other (the sort of memory it takes to cognize a sentence or a paragraph, for instance), is an operative memory of an event that has not yet left consciousness. Both are modes of memory, to be sure, but they are qualitatively different modes of memory, Husserl argues.

Moreover, in each moment of experience, we are at the same time looking forward to the future in some mode of expectation. This, too, is something we experience on a frequent basis. For instance, when walking through a door that we walk through frequently, we might casually tap the handle and lead with our head and shoulders because we expect that the door, unlocked, will open for us as it always does; when sitting at the bus stop, as the bus approaches the curb, we stand, because we expect that it is our bus, and that it is stopping to let us on. Our expectations are not quite as salient as are our primary memories, but they are there. All it takes is a rupture of some sort—the door may be locked, causing us to hit our head; the bus may not be our bus, or the driver may not see us and may continue driving—to realize that the structure of expectation was present in our consciousness.

Time, Husserl argues, is not experienced as a series of discrete, independent moments that arise and instantly die; rather, experience of the present is always thick with past and future. What Aristotle refers to as the now, Husserl calls the ‘primal impression,’ the moment of impact between consciousness and its intentional object, which is ever-renewed, but also ever-passing away; but the primal impression is constantly surrounded by a halo of retention (or primary memory) and protention (primary expectation). This structure, taken altogether, is what Husserl calls, “the living present.”

Derrida and Deleuze will each employ (while subjecting to strident criticism) Husserl’s concept of the living present. If the present is always constituted as a relation of past to future, then the very nature of time is itself relational, that is to say, it cannot be conceived as points on a line or as seconds on a clock. If time is essentially or structurally relational, then everything we think about ‘things’ (insofar as things are constituted in time), and knowledge (insofar as it takes place in time), will be radically transformed as well. To fully think through the implications of Husserl’s discovery entails a fundamental reorientation toward time and along with it, being. Deleuze employs the retentional-protentional structure of time, while discarding the notion of the primal impression. Derrida will stick with the terms of Husserl’s structure, while demonstrating that the present in Husserl is always infected with or contaminated by the non-present, the structure of which Derrida calls différance.

c. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics

In a sense it is difficult to talk in a synthetic way about what Deleuze and Derrida find wrong with traditional metaphysics, because they each, in the context of their own specific projects, find distinct problems with the history of metaphysics. However, the following is clear: (1) If we can use the term ‘metaphysics’ to characterize the attempt to understand the fundamental nature of things, and; (2) If we can acknowledge that traditionally the effort to do that has been carried out through the lenses of representational thinking in some form or other, then; (3) the critiques that Deleuze and Derrida offer against the history of metaphysical thinking are centered around the point that traditional metaphysics ultimately gets things wrong.

For Deleuze, this will come down to a necessary and fundamental imprecision that accompanies traditional metaphysics. Inasmuch as the task of metaphysics is to think the nature of the thing, and inasmuch as it sets for itself essentialist parameters for doing so, it necessarily filters its own understanding of the thing through conceptual representations, philosophy can never arrive at an adequate concept of the individual. To our heart’s desire, we may compound and multiply the concepts that we use to characterize a thing, but there will always necessarily be some aspect of that thing left untouched by thinking. Let us use a simple example, an inflated ball—we can describe it by as many representational concepts as we like: it is a certain color or a certain pattern, made of a certain material (rubber or plastic, perhaps), a certain size, it has a certain degree of elasticity, is filled with a certain amount of air, and so forth. However many categories or concepts we may apply to this ball, the nature of this ball itself will always elude us. Our conceptual characterization will always reach a terminus; our concepts can only go so far down. The ball is these characterizations, but it is also different from its characterizations as well. For Deleuze, if our ontology cannot reach down to the thing itself, if it is structurally and essentially incapable of comprehending the constitution of the thing, (as any substance metaphysics will be), then it is, for the most part, worthless as an ontology.

Derrida casts his critiques of the history of metaphysics in the Heideggerian language of presence. The history of philosophy, Derrida argues, is the metaphysics of presence, and the Western religious and philosophical tradition operates by categorizing being according to conceptual binaries: (good/evil, form/matter, identity/difference, subject/object, voice/writing, soul/body, mind/body, invisible/visible, life/death, God/Satan, heaven/earth, reason/passion, positive/negative, masculine/feminine, true/apparent, light/dark, innocence/fallenness, purity/contamination, and so forth.) Metaphysics consists of first establishing the binary, but from the moment it is established, it is already clear which of the two terms will be considered the good term and which the pejorative term—the good term is the one that is conceptually analogous to presence in either its spatial or temporal sense. The philosopher’s task, then, is to isolate the presence as the primary term, and to conceptually purge it of its correlative absent term.

A few examples will help elucidate this point: for Parmenides, divine wisdom entails an attempt to think that which is, at every present moment, the same. Heraclitean flux is the way of the masses. This in part shapes Plato’s emphasis on the eternality of the Form—while the material world changes with the passage of each new present, the Form remains the same, (ever-present or eternal); but in addition, the Form is also that which is closest to (a term of presence) the nature of the soul. In Plato the body, (given that it is in constant flux), is the prison of the soul, and in the Phaedo, life is declared a disease, for which death is the cure. In Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, the most complete happiness for the human being lies in the life of contemplation, because the capacity for contemplation is that which makes us most like the gods, (who are ever the same). So we would be happiest if we could contemplate all the time; however, we unfortunately cannot (as we also have bodies and so, various familial, social, and political responsibilities). In Christianity, the flesh is subject to change (which is the very essence of corruptibility) while the Spirit is incorruptible (or ever-present); for Descartes, (and for the early phenomenological tradition), only what is spatially present (that is, immediate to consciousness), is indubitable. Whether or not the object of my present perception exists in the so-called real world, it is nevertheless indubitable that I am experiencing what I am experiencing, in the moment at which I am experiencing it—Descartes even goes so far as to define clarity (one of his conditions for ‘truth’) as that which is present. And for Descartes, the body (insofar as it is at least possible to doubt its existence), is not most essentially me; rather, my soul is what I am. We saw Aristotle’s emphasis on the now, or the present, as the yardstick against which time is measured. The spatial and temporal senses of the emphasis on presence are completely solidified in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, whose phenomenological reduction attempts to focus its attention exclusively on the phenomena of consciousness, because only then can it accord with the philosophical demand for apodicticity; and he understands this experience as constituted on the model of the living present. In each of these cases, a presence is valorized, and its correlative absence is suppressed.

As was the case with Deleuze, however, Derrida will argue that the self-proclaimed task of metaphysics ultimately fails. Thus, (and against some of his more dismissive critics), Derrida operates in the name of truth—when the history of metaphysics posits that presence is primary, and absence secondary, this claim, Derrida shows, is false. Metaphysics, in all of its manifestations, attempts to cast out the impure, but somehow, the impure always returns, in the form of a supplementary term; the secondary term is always ultimately required in order to supplement the primary term. Derrida’s project then is dedicated to demonstrating that if the subordinate term is required in order to supplement the so-called primary term, it can only be because the primary term suffers always and originally from a lack or a deficiency of some sort. In other words, the absence that philosophy sought to cast out was present and infecting the present term from the origin.

3. Key Differential Ontologists

a. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist

It is in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, as we said above, that Derrida discovers the constitutive play known as différance. In its effort to isolate ideal essences, constituted within the sphere of consciousness, phenomenology brackets or suspends all questions having to do with the real existence of the external world, the belief in which Husserl refers to as the natural attitude. The natural attitude is the non-thematic subjective attitude that takes for granted the real existence of the real world, absent and apart from my (or any) experience of it. Science or philosophy, in the mode of the natural attitude, ontologically distinguishes being from our perceptions of being, from which point it becomes impossible to ever again bridge the gap between the two. Try as it might, philosophy in the natural attitude can only ever have representations of being, and certainty (the telos of philosophical activity) becomes untenable. With this in mind, we get Husserl’s famous principle of all principles: “that everything originarily… offered to us in ‘intuition’ is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there.” (Ideas I, §24) Husserl thus proposes a change in attitude, in what he calls the phenomenological epochē, which suspends all questions regarding the external existence of the objects of consciousness, along with the constituting priority of the empirical self. Both self and world are bracketed, revealing the correlative structure of the world itself in relation to consciousness thereof, opening a sphere of pure immanence, or, in Derrida’s terminology, pure presence. It is for this reason that Husserl represents for Derrida the most strident defense of the metaphysics of presence, and it is for this reason that his philosophy also serves as the ground out of which the notion of constitutive difference is discovered.

In his landmark 1967 text, Voice and Phenomenon, Derrida takes on Husserl’s notion of the sign. The sign, we should note, is typically understood as a stand-in for something that is currently absent. Linguistically a sign is a means by which a speaker conveys to a listener the meaning that currently resides within the inner experience of the speaker. The contents of one person’s experience cannot be transferred or related to the experience of a listener except through the usage of signs, (which we call ‘language’). Knowing this, and knowing that Husserl’s philosophy is an attempt to isolate a pure moment of presence, it is little wonder that he wants, inasmuch as it is possible, to do away with the usage of signs, and isolate an interior moment of presence. It is precisely this aim that Derrida takes apart.

In the opening chapter of Husserl’s First Logical Investigation, titled “Essential Distinctions,” Husserl draws a distinction between different types or functions of signs: expressions and indications. He claims signs are always pointing to something, but what they point to can assume different forms. An indication signifies without pointing to a sense or a meaning. The flu or bodily infection, for instance, is not the meaning of the fever, but it is brought to our attention by way of the fever—the fever, that is, points to an ailment in the body. An expression, however, is a sign that is, itself, charged with conceptual meaning; it is a linguistic sign. There are countless types of signs—animal tracks in the snow point to the recent presence of life, a certain aroma in the house may indicate that a certain food or even a certain ethnicity of food, is being prepared—but expressions are signs that are themselves meaningful.

This distinction (indication/expression) is itself problematic, however, and does not seem to be fundamentally sustainable. An indication may very well be an expression, and expressions are almost always indications. If one’s significant other leaves one a note on the table, for instance, before one has even read the words on the paper, the sheer presence of writing, left in a certain way, on a sheet of paper, situated a certain way on the table, indicates: (1) That the beloved is no longer in the house, and; (2) That the beloved has left one a message to be read. These signs are both indications and expressions. Furthermore, every time we use an expression of some sort, we are indicating something, namely, we are pointing toward an ideal meaning, empirical states of affairs, and so forth. In effect, one would be hard pressed to find a single example of a use of an expression that was not, in some sense, indicative.

Husserl, however, will argue that even if, in fact, expressions are always caught up in an indicative function, that this has nothing to do with the essential distinction, obtaining de jure (if not de facto) between indications and expressions. Husserl cannot relinquish this conviction because, after all, he is attempting to isolate a pure moment of self-presence of meaning. So if expressions are signs charged with meaning, then Husserl will be compelled to locate a pure form of expression, which will require the absolute separation of the expression from its indicative function. Indeed he thinks that this is possible. The reason expressions are almost always indicative is that we use them to communicate with others, and in the going-forth of the sign into the world, some measure of the meaning is always lost—no matter how many signs we use to articulate our experience, the experience can never be perfectly and wholly recreated within the mind of the listener. So to isolate the expressive essence of the expression, we must suspend the going-forth of the sign into the world. This is accomplished in the soliloquy of the inner life of consciousness.

In one’s interior monologue, there is nothing empirical, (nothing from the world), and hence, nothing indicative. The signs themselves have only ideal, not real, existence. Likewise, the signs employed in the interior monologue are not indicative in the way that signs in everyday communication are. Communicative expressions point us to states of affairs or the internal experiences of another person; in short, they point us to empirical events. Expressions of the interior monologue, however, do not point us to empirical realities, but rather, Husserl claims that in the interior expression, the sign points away from itself, and toward its ideal sense. For Husserl, therefore, the purest, most meaningful mode of expression is one in which nothing is, strictly speaking, expressed to anyone.

One might nevertheless wonder, is it not the case, that when one ‘converses’ internally with oneself, that one is, in some sense, articulating meaning to oneself? Here is a mundane example, one which has happened to each of us at some point in time: we walk into a room, and forget why we have entered the room. “Why did I come in here?” we might silently utter to ourselves, and after a moment, we might say to ourselves, “Ah, yes, I came in here to turn down the thermostat,” or something of the like. Is it not the case that the individual is communicating something to herself in this monologue?

Husserl responds in the negative. The signs we are using are not making known to the self a content that was previously inaccessible to the self, (which is what takes place in communication). In pointing away from itself and directly toward the sense, the sense is not conveyed from a self to a self, but rather, the sense of the expression is experienced by the subject at exactly that same moment in time.

This is where Derrida brings into the discussion Husserl’s notion of the living present, for this emphasis on the exact same moment in time relies upon Husserl’s notion of the primal impression. Derrida writes, “The sharp point of the instant, the identity of lived-experience present to itself in the same instant bears therefore the whole weight of this demonstration.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 51). In our discussion above of Husserl’s living present, we saw that the primal impression is constantly displaced by a new primal impression—it is in constant motion. Nevertheless, this does not keep Husserl from referring to the primal impression in terms of a point; it is, he says, the source-point on the basis of which retention is established. While the primal impression is always, as we saw with Husserl, surrounded by a halo of retention and protention, nevertheless this halo is always thought from the absolute center of the primal impression, as the source-point of experience. It is the “non-displaceable center, an eye or living nucleus” of temporality. (Voice and Phenomenon, 53)

This, we note, is the Husserlian manifestation of the emphasis on the temporal sense of presence in the philosophical tradition. Here, we should also note: Derrida never attempts to argue that philosophy should move away from the emphasis on presence. The philosophical tradition is defined by, Derrida claims, its emphasis on the present; the present provides the very foundation of certainty throughout the history of philosophy; it is certainty, in a sense. The present comprises an ineliminable essential element of the whole endeavor of philosophy. So to call it into question is not to try to bring a radical transformation to philosophy, but to shift one’s vantage point to one that inhabits the space between philosophy and non-philosophy. Indeed, Derrida motions in this direction, which is one of the reasons that Derrida is more comfortable than many traditional academic philosophers writing in the style of and in communication with literary figures. The emphasis on presence within philosophy, strictly speaking is incontestable.

Husserl, we saw, formulated his notion of the living present on the basis of his insistence on a qualitative distinction between retention as a mode of memory still connected to the present moment of consciousness, and representational memory, that deliberately calls to mind a moment of the past that has, since its occurrence, left consciousness. This means, for Husserl, that retention must be understood in the mode of Presentation, as opposed to Representation. Retention is a direct intuition of what has just passed, directly presented, and fully seen, in the moment of the now, as opposed to represented memory, which is not. Retention is not, strictly speaking, the present; the primal impression is the present. Nevertheless, retention is still attached to the moment of the now. Furthermore, there is a sense in which retention is necessary to give us the experience of the present as such. The primal impression, where the point of contact occurs, is in a constant mode of passing away, and the impression only becomes recognizable in the mode of retention—as we said, to truly experience a song as a song entails that one must keep in one’s memory the preceding few notes; but this is just another way of saying that the present is constituted in part on the basis of memory, even if memory of what has just passed.

Derrida diagnoses, then, a tension operating at the heart of Husserl’s thinking. On the one hand, Husserl’s phenomenology requires the sharp point of the instant in order to have a pure moment of self-presence, wherein meaning, without the intermediary of signs, can be found. In this sense, retention, though primary memory, is memory nonetheless, and does not give us the present, but is rather, Husserl claims, the “antithesis of perception.” (On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time, 41) Nevertheless, the present as such is only ever constituted on the basis of its becoming concretized and solidified in the acts that constitute the stretching out of time, in retention. Moreover, given that retention is still essentially connected to the primal impression, (which is itself always in the mode of passing away) there is not a radical distinction between retention and primal impression; rather, they are continuous, and the primal impression is really only, Husserl claims, an ideal limit. There is thus a continual accommodation of Husserlian presence to non-presence, which entails the admission of a form of otherness into the self-present now-point of experience. This accommodation is what keeps fundamentally distinct memory as retention and memory as representation.

Nevertheless, the common root, making possible both retention and representational memory, is the structural possibility of repetition itself, which Derrida calls the trace. The trace is the mark of otherness, or the necessary relation of interiority to exteriority. Husserl’s living present is marked by the structure of the trace, Derrida argues, because the primal impression for Husserl, never occurs without a structural retention attached to it. Thus, in the very moment, the selfsame point of time, when the primal impression is impressed within experience, what is essentially necessary to the structure, (in other words, not an accidental feature thereof), is the repeatability of the primal impression within retention. To be experienced in a primal impression therefore requires that the object of experience be repeatable, such that it can mark itself within the mode of retention, and ultimately, representational memory. Thus the primal impression is traced with exteriority, or non-presence, before it is ever empirically stamped.

On the basis of this trace that constitutes the presence of the primal impression, Derrida introduces the concept of différance:

[T]he trace in the most universal sense, is a possibility that must not only inhabit the pure actuality of the now, but must also constitute it by means of the very movement of the différance that the possibility inserts into the pure actuality of the now. Such a trace is, if we are able to hold onto this language without contradicting it and erasing it immediately, more ‘originary’ than the phenomenological originarity itself... In all of these directions, the presence of the present is thought beginning from the fold of the return, beginning from the movement of repetition and not the reverse. Does not the fact that this fold in presence or in self-presence is irreducible, that this trace or this différance is always older than presence and obtains for it its openness, forbid us from speaking of a simple self-identity ‘im selben Augenblick’? (Voice and Phenomenon, 58)

Différance, Derrida says, is a movement, a differentiating movement, on the basis of which the presence (the ground of philosophical certainty) is opened up. The self-presence of subjectivity, in which certainty is established, is inseparable from an experience of time, and the structural essentialities of the experience of time are marked by the trace. It is more originary than the primordiality of phenomenological experience, because it is what makes it possible in the first place. From this it follows, Derrida claims, that Husserl’s project of locating a moment of pure presence will be necessarily thwarted, because in attempting to rigorously think it through, we have found hiding behind it this strange structure signifying a movement and hence, not a this, that Derrida calls différance.

Using Derrida’s terminology, (which we shall presently dissect), we can say that différance is the non-originary, constituting-disruption of presence. Let us take this bit by bit. Différance is constituting—this signifies, as we saw in Husserl, that it is on the basis of this movement that presence is constituted. Derrida claims that it is the play of différance that makes possible all modes of presence, including the binary categories and concepts in accordance with which philosophy, since Plato, has conducted itself. That it is constitutive does not, however, mean that it is originary, at least not without qualification. To speak of origins, for Derrida, implies an engagement with a presumed moment of innocence or purity, in other words, a moment of presence, from which our efforts at meaning have somehow fallen away. Derrida says, rather, that différance is a “non-origin which is originary.” (“Freud and the Scene of Writing,” Writing and Difference, 203) Différance is, in a sense, an origin, but one that is already, at the origin, contaminated; hence it is a non-originary origin.

At the same time, because différance as play and movement always underlie the constitutive functioning of philosophical concepts, it likewise always attenuates this functioning, even as it constitutes it. Différance prevents the philosophical concepts from ever carrying out fully the operations that their author intends them to carry out. This constituting-disruption is the source of one of Derrida’s more (in)famous descriptions of the deconstructive project: “But this condition of possibility turns into a condition of impossibility.” (Of Grammatology, 74)

Différance attenuates both senses of presence to which we referred above: (1) Spatially, it differs, creating spaces, ruptures, chasms, and differences, rather than the desired telos of absolute proximity; (2) Temporally, it defers, delaying presence from ever being fully attained. Thus it is that Derrida, capitalizing on the “two motifs of the Latin differre...” will understand différance in the dual sense of differing and deferring (“Différance,” in Margins of Philosophy, 8)

Derrida is therefore a differential ontologist in that, through his critiques of the metaphysical tradition, he attempts to think the fundamental explicitly on the basis of a differential structure, reading the canonical texts of the philosophical tradition both with and against the intentions of their authors. In so doing, he attempts to expose the play of force underlying the constitution of meaning, and thereby, to open new trajectories of thinking, rethinking the very concept of the concept, and forging a path “toward the unnameable.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 66)

b. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist

As early as 1954, in one of Deleuze’s first publications, (a review of Jean Hyppolite’s book, Logic and Existence), Deleuze stresses the urgency for an ontology of pure difference, one that does not rely upon the notion of negation, because negation is merely difference, pushed to its outermost limit. An ontology of pure difference means an attempt to think difference as pure relation, rather than as a not-.

The reason for this urgency, as we saw above, is that the task of philosophy is to have a direct relation to things, and in order for this to happen, philosophy needs to grasp the thing itself, and this means, the thing as it differs from everything else that it is not, the thing as it essentially is. Reason, he claims, must reach down to the level of the individual. In other words, philosophy must attempt to think what he calls internal difference, or difference internal to Being itself. Above we noted that however many representational concepts we may adduce in order to characterize a thing, (our example above was a ball), so long as we are using concepts rooted in identity to grasp it, we will still be unable to think down to the level of what makes this, this. Therefore, philosophy suffers from an essential imprecision, which only differential ontology can repair.

This imprecision is rooted, Deleuze argues, in the Aristotelian moment, specifically in Aristotle’s metaphysics of analogy. Aristotle’s notion of metaphysics as first philosophy is that, while other sciences concentrate on one or another domain of being, metaphysics is to be the science of being qua being. Unlike every other science, (which all study some genus or species of being), the object of the metaphysical science, being qua being, is not a genus. This is because any given genus is differentiated (by way of differences) into species. Any species, beneath its given genus, is fully a member of that genus, but the difference that has so distinguished it, is not. Let us take an example: the genus animal. In this case, the difference, we might say, is rational, by which the genus animal is speciated into the species of man and beast, for Aristotle. Both man and beast are equally members of the genus animal, but rational, the differentia whereby they are separated, is not. Differentiae cannot belong, properly, to the given genus of which they are differentiae, and yet, differences exist, that is, they have being. Therefore, if differences have being, and the differentiae of any given genus cannot belong, properly speaking, to that genus, it follows that being cannot be a genus.

Metaphysics therefore cannot be the science of being as such, (because, given that there is no genus, ‘being,’ there is no being as such), but rather, of being qua being, or, put otherwise, the science that focuses on beings insofar as they are said to be. The metaphysician, Aristotle holds, must study being by way of abstraction—all that is is said to be in virtue of something common, and this commonality, Aristotle holds, is rooted in a thing’s being a substance, or a bearer of properties. The primary and common way in which a thing is said to be, Aristotle argues, is that it is a substance, a bearer of properties. Properties are, no doubt, but they are only to the extent that there is a substance there to bear them. There is no ‘red’ as such; there are only red things. Metaphysics, therefore, is the science that studies primarily the nature of what it means to be a substance, and what it means to be an attribute of a substance, but insofar as it relates to a substance. All of these other qualities, and along with them, the Aristotelian categories, are related analogically, through substances, to being. This explains Aristotle’s famous dictum: Being is said in many ways. (Metaphysics, IV.2) This is Aristotle’s doctrine known as the equivocity of being. Being is hierarchical in that there are greater and lesser degrees to which a thing may be said to be. In this sense, analogical being is a natural bedfellow with the theological impetus, in that it provides a means of speaking and thinking about God that does not flirt with heresy, that falls into neither of the two following traps: (1) Believing that a finite mind could ever possess knowledge of an infinite being; (2) Thinking that God’s qualities, for instance, his love or his mercy, are to be understood in like fashion to our own. Analogical being easily and naturally allows the Scholastic tradition to hierarchize the scala naturae, the great chain of being, thus creating a space in language and in thought for the ineffable.

Deleuze, however, will argue that the Aristotelian equivocity disallows ontology a genuine concept of Being, of the individual, or of difference itself: “However, this form of distribution commanded by the categories seemed to us to betray the nature of Being (as a cardinal and collective concept) and the nature of the distributions themselves (as nomadic rather than sedentary and fixed distributions), as well as the nature of difference (as individuating difference).” (Difference and Repetition, 269) By ‘cardinal’ and ‘collective,’ respectively, Deleuze means Being as the fundamental nature of what-is, (which is the individuating power of differentiation) and being as the whole of what-is. Analogical being, Deleuze objects, cannot think being as such (because being is not a genus, for Aristotle), and then, because it posits substances and categories (fixed, rather than fluid, models of distribution of being), it misses the nature of difference itself (because difference is always ‘filtered’ through a higher concept of identity), as well as the ability to think the individual (because thought can only go as far ‘down’ as the substance, which is always comprehended through our concepts). Thus, ontology, understood analogically, cannot do what it is designed to do: to think being.

To think a genuine concept of difference (and hence, being) requires an ontology which abandons the analogical model of being and affirms the univocity of being, that being is said in only one sense of everything of which it is said. Here, Deleuze cites three key figures that have made such a transformation in thinking possible: John Duns Scotus, Benedict de Spinoza, and Friedrich Nietzsche.

Deleuze calls Duns Scotus’ book, the Opus Oxoniense, “the greatest book of pure ontology.” (Difference and Repetition, 39) Scotus argues against Thomas Aquinas, and hence, against the Aristotelian doctrine of equivocity, in an effort to salvage the reliability of proofs for God’s existence, rooted, as they must be, in the experiences and the minds of human beings. Any argument that draws a conclusion about the being of God on the basis of some fact about his creatures presupposes, Scotus thinks, the univocal expression of the term, ‘being.’ If the being of God is wholly other, or even, analogous to, the being of man, then the relation of the given premises to the conclusion, “God exists,” thereby loses all validity. While, as noted, understanding being analogically affords the theological tradition a handy way of keeping the creation distinct from its creator, this same distance, Scotus thinks, also keeps us from truly possessing natural knowledge about God. So in order to save that knowledge, Scotus had to abolish the analogical understanding of being. However, Deleuze notes, in order to keep from falling into a heresy of another sort (namely, pantheism, the conviction that everything is God), Scotus had to neutralize univocal being. The abstract concept of being precedes the division into the categories of “finite” and “infinite,” so that, even if being is univocal, God’s being is nevertheless distinguished from man’s by way of God’s infinity. Being is therefore, univocal, but neutral and abstract, not affirmed.

Spinoza offers the next step in the affirmation of univocal being. Spinoza creates an elaborate ontology of expression and immanent causality, consisting of substance, attributes, and modes. There is but one substance, God or Nature, which is eternal, self-caused, necessary, and absolutely infinite. A given attribute is conceived through itself and is understood as constituting the essence of a substance, while a mode is an affection of a substance, a way a substance is. God is absolutely free because there is nothing outside of Nature which could determine God to act in such and such a way, so God expresses himself in his creation from the necessity of his own Nature. God’s nature is his power, and his power is his virtue. It is sometimes said that Spinoza’s God is not the theist’s God, and this is no doubt true, but it is equally true that Spinoza’s Nature is not the naturalist’s nature, because Spinoza equates Nature and God; in other words, he makes the world of Nature an object of worshipful admiration, or affirmation. Thus Spinoza takes the step that Scotus could not; nevertheless, Spinoza does not quite complete the transformation to the univocity of being. Spinoza leaves intact the priority of the substance over its modes. Modes can be thought only through substance, but the converse is not true. Thus for the great step Spinoza takes towards the immanentizing of philosophy, he leaves a tiny bit of transcendence untouched. Deleuze writes, “substance must itself be said of the modes and only of the modes.” (Difference and Repetition, 40)

This shift is made, Deleuze claims, with Nietzsche’s notion of eternal return. Deleuze understands Nietzsche’s eternal return in the terms of what Deleuze calls the disjunctive synthesis. In the disjunctive synthesis, we find the in itself of Deleuze’s notion of difference in itself. The eternal return, or the constant returning of the same as the different, constitutes systems, but these systems are, as we saw above, nomadic and fluid, constituted on the basis of disjunctive syntheses, which is itself a differential communication between two or more divergent series.

Given in experience, Deleuze claims, is diversity—not difference as such, but differences, different things, limits, oppositions, and so forth. But this experience of diversity presupposes, Deleuze claims, “a swarm of differences, a pluralism of free, wild, untamed differences; a properly differential and original space and time.” (Difference and Repetition, 50) In other words, the perceived, planar effects of limitations and oppositions presuppose a pure depth or a sub-phenomenal play of constitutive difference. Insofar as they are the conditions of space and time as we sense them, this depth that he is looking for is itself an imperceptible spatio-temporality. This depth (or ‘pure spatium’), he claims, is where difference, singularities, series, and systems, relate and interact. It is necessary, Deleuze claims, because the developmental and differential processes whereby living systems are constituted take place so rapidly and violently that they would tear apart a fully-formed being. Deleuze, comparing the world to an egg, argues that there are “systematic vital movements, torsions and drifts, that only the embryo can sustain: an adult would be torn apart by them.” (Difference and Repetition, 118)

At the embryonic level are series, with each series being defined by the differences between its terms, rather than its terms themselves. Rather, we should say that its terms are themselves differences, or what Deleuze calls intensities: “Intensities are implicated multiplicities, ‘implexes,’ made up of relations between asymmetrical elements.” (Difference and Repetition, 244). An intensity is essentially an energy, but an energy is always a difference or an imbalance, folded in on itself, an essentially elemental asymmetry. These intensities are the terms of a given series. The terms, however, are themselves related to other terms, and through these relations, these intensities are continuously modified. An intensity is an embryonic quantity in that its own internal resonance, which is constitutive of higher levels of synthesis and actualization, pulsates in a pure speed and time that would devastate a constituted being; it is for this reason that qualities and surface phenomena can only come to be on a plane in which difference as such is cancelled or aborted. In explicating its implicated differences, the system, so constituted, cancels out those differences, even if the differential ground rumbles beneath.

A system is formed whenever two or more of these heterogeneous series communicate. Insofar as each series is itself constituted by differences, the communication that takes place between the two heterogeneous series is a difference relating differences, a second-order difference, which Deleuze calls the differenciator, in that these differences relate, and in so relating, they differenciate first-order differences. This relation takes place through what Deleuze calls the dark precursor, comparing it to the negative path cleared for a bolt of lightning. Once this communication is established, the system explodes: “coupling between heterogeneous systems, from which is derived an internal resonance within the system, and from which in turn is derived a forced movement the amplitude of which exceeds that of the basic series themselves.” (Difference and Repetition, 117) The constitution of a series thus results in what we referred to above as the explication of qualities, which are themselves the results of a cancelled difference. Thus, Deleuze claims, the compounding or synthesis of these systems, series, and relations are the introduction of spatio-temporal dynamisms, which are themselves the sources of qualities and extensions.

The whole of being, ultimately, is a system, connected by way of these differential relations—difference relating to difference through difference—the very nature of Deleuze’s disjunctive synthesis. Difference in itself teems with vitality and life. As systems differentiate, their differences ramify throughout the system, and in so doing, series form new series, and new systems, de-enlisting and redistributing the singular points of interest and their constitutive and corresponding nomadic relations, which are themselves implicating, and, conversely, explicated in the phenomenal realm. The disjunctive synthesis is the affirmative employment of the creativity brought about by the various plays of differences. Against Leibniz’s notion of compossibility is opposed the affirmation of incompossibility. Leibniz defined the perfection of the cosmos in terms of its compossibility, and this in terms of a maximization of continuity. The disjunctive synthesis brings about the communication and cooperative disharmony of divergent and heterogeneous series; it does not, thereby, cancel the differences between them. Where incompossibility for Leibniz was a means of exclusion—an infinity of possible worlds excluded from reality on the basis of their incompossibility, in the hands of Deleuze, it becomes a means of opening the thing to the possible infinity of events. It is in this sense that Nietzsche’s eternal return is, for Deleuze, the affirmation of the return of the different, and hence, the affirmation, all of chance, all at once.

Finally, the eternal return is the name that Deleuze gives to the pulsating-contracting temporality according to which the pure spatium or depth differenciates. In Chapter 2 of Difference and Repetition, Deleuze employs the Husserlian discussion of the living present. However, unlike Derrida, Deleuze will simply discard Husserl’s notion of the primal impression—this term never makes an appearance in Difference and Repetition. Deleuze will argue that, with respect to time, the present is all there is, but the present itself is nothing more than the relation of retention to protention. If the present were truly present, (in the sense of a self-contained kernel of time, like Husserl’s primal impression), then, just as Aristotle noted, the present could never pass, because in order to pass, it would have to pass within another moment. The present can only pass, Deleuze claims, because the past is already in the present, reaching through the present, into the future, drawing the future into itself. Time, in other words, is nothing more than the contraction of past and future. The present, therefore, is the beating heart of difference in itself, but it is a present constituted on the basis of a differentiation.

Deleuze is therefore a differential ontologist in that he attempts to formulate a notion of difference that is: (1) The constitutive play of forces underlying the constitution of identities; (2) Purely relational, that is, non-negational, and hence, not in any way subordinate to the principle of identity. It is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of identity but in such a way as to not recreate the presuppositions surrounding identity at the level of the conditions themselves—it is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of real experience, the world as it is lived.

4. Conclusion

To briefly sum up, we can say that Derrida and Deleuze are the two key differential ontologists in the history of philosophy. While others before them were indeed thinkers of multiplicity, as opposed to thinkers of identity, none, so rigorously as Derrida and Deleuze, came to the conclusion that what was required in order to truly think multiplicity was an explicit formulation of a concept of difference, in itself. One of the key distinctions between the two of them, which explains many of their other differences, is their respective attitudes towards fidelity to the tradition of philosophy. While Derrida will understand fidelity to the tradition in the sense of embracing the presuppositions and prejudices of the tradition, using them, ultimately, to think beyond the tradition, but in such a way as to speak constantly of the end of metaphysics, and ultimately eschewing the adoption of any traditional philosophical terms such as ontology, being, and so forth; Deleuze, on the contrary, will understand fidelity to the philosophical tradition in the sense of embracing what philosophy has always sought to do, to think the fundamental, and will, in the name of this task, happily discard any presuppositions or prejudices that the tradition has attempted to bestow. So, while Derrida will, for instance, claim that the founding privilege of presence is not up for grabs in philosophy, but will, at the same time, avoid using terms like experience, being, ontology, concept, and so forth, Deleuze will claim that it is precisely the emphasis on presence (in the form of representational concepts and categories) that has kept philosophy from living up to its task. Therefore, the prejudice should be discarded. But that does not mean, Deleuze will argue, that we should give up metaphysics. If the old metaphysics no longer works, throw it out, and build a new one, from the ground up, if need be, but a new metaphysics, all the same.

5. References and Further Reading

The following is an annotated list of the key sources in which the differential ontologies of Derrida and Deleuze are formulated.

a. Primary Sources

  • Deleuze, Gilles. Bergsonism. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. New York: Zone Books, 1988.
    • Henri Bergson was a French “celebrity” philosopher in the early twentieth century, whose philosophy had very much fallen out of favor in France by the mid to late 1920s, as Husserlian phenomenology began to work its way into Paris. Deleuze’s 1966 text on Bergson played no small part in bringing Bergson back into fashion. In this text, Deleuze analyzes the Bergsonian notions of durée, memory, and élan vital, demonstrating the consistent trajectory of Bergson’s work from beginning to end, and highlighting the centrality of Bergson’s notion of time for the entirety of Deleuze’s thought.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Desert Islands and Other Texts (1953-1974). Ed. David Lapoujade, Trans. Michael Taormina. Los Angeles and New York: Semiotext(e), 2004.
    • This text contains many of Deleuze’s most important essays from his philosophically “formative” years. It contains his 1954 review of Jean Hyppolite’s Logic and Existence, as well as very early essays on Bergson. In addition, it contains interviews and round-table discussions surrounding the period leading up to and following the 1968 release of Difference and Repetition.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Difference and Repetition. Translated by Paul Patton. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
    • This is without question the most important book Deleuze ever wrote. It was his principal thesis for the Doctorat D’Etat in 1968, and it is in this text that the various elements that had emerged from his book-length engagements with other philosophers over the years come together into the critique of representation and the formulation of a differential ontology.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza. Translated by Martin Joughin. New York: Zone Books, 1992.
    • This book was his secondary, historical thesis in 1968, though there is good evidence that the book was actually first drafted in 1961-62, around the same time as the book on Nietzsche. The concept of expression, here analyzed in Spinoza, plays a very important role for Deleuze, and it is Spinoza who provides an alternative ontology of immanence which, contrary to that of Hegel, (quite prominent in mid-1960s France), does not rely upon the movement of negation, a concept that, for Deleuze, does not belong in the domain of ontology. As we saw in the article, Being is itself creative, and hence an object of affirmation, and to make negation an integral element in one’s ontology is, for Deleuze, antithetical to affirmation. Deleuze emphasizes expression, rather than negation. This emphasis already plays a role in the 1954 Review of Hyppolite (mentioned above).
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Kant’s Critical Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984.
    • In this 1963 text, Deleuze looks at the philosophy of Immanuel Kant, through the lens of the third CritiqueThe Critique of Judgment, arguing that Kant, (thanks in large part to Salomon Maimon) recognized the problems in the first two Critiques, and began attempting to correct them at the end of his life. In this text Deleuze examines Kant’s notion of the faculties, highlighting that by the time of the third Critique, (and unlike its two predecessors), the faculties are in a discordant accord—none legislating over the others.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. The Logic of Sense. Translated by Mark Lester with Charles Stivale. Edited by Constantin V. Boundas. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1990.
    • This text is interesting for a number of reasons. First, published in 1969, just one year following Difference and Repetition, it explores many of the same themes of Difference and Repetition, such as becomingtimeeternal returnsingularities, and so forth. At the same time, other themes, such as the event become centrally important, and these themes are now explored through the notion of sense. In a way it is in part a reorientation of Difference and Repetition. But one of the most important points to note is that the notion of the fractal subject is brought into conversation with psychoanalytic theory, and thus, this text forms a bridge between Deleuze’s earlier philosophical works and his political works with Félix Guattari, the first of which, Anti-Oedipus, was released just three years later, in 1972. In addition, the appendices in this volume include important essays on the reversal of Platonism, on the Stoics, and on Pierre Klossowski.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Nietzsche and Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1983.
    • This book, from 1962, was Deleuze’s second book. It may be a stretch to say that this book is the second most important book in Deleuze’s corpus. Nevertheless, it is certainly high on the list of importance. Here we see in their formational expressions, some of the motifs that will dominate all of Deleuze’s works up through The Logic of Sense. Among them are the rejection of negation, the articulation of the eternal return, the incompleteness of the Kantian critique, the purely relational ontology of force, which is the will to power, and so forth. This book lays out in very raw and accessible, (if somewhat underdeveloped) form some of the most significant criticisms later developed in Difference and Repetition.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Dissemination. Translated by Barbara Johnson. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This text was published in 1972, (along with Positions and Margins of Philosophy) as part of Derrida’s second publication blitz, (the first being in 1967). In addition to the titular essay, it contains the very important essay on Plato, “Plato’s Pharmacy.” Like much of what Derrida wrote, this text is extremely difficult, and probably not a good starter text for Derrida. Nonetheless, it’s one of his more important books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Edmund Husserl’s Origin of Geometry: An Introduction. Lincoln, Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press, 1989.
    • In 1962, Derrida translated an essay from very late in Husserl’s career, “The Origin of Geometry.” He also wrote a translator’s introduction to the essay—Husserl’s essay is about 18 pages long, while Derrida’s introduction is about 150 pages in length. This essay is of particular interest because it deals with the problem of how the ideal is constituted in the sphere of the subject; this will be a problem that will occupy Derrida up through the period of Voice and Phenomenon and beyond.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Margins of Philosophy. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1982.
    • This book is a collection of essays from the late-1960s up through the early 1970s, and is another from the 1972 publication blitz. It is very important for numerous reasons, but in no small part because it is here that his engagement with the work of Martin Heidegger, (which will occupy him throughout the remainder of his career), robustly begins. It contains some of the most important essays from Derrida’s mature work. Among them are the famous “Différance” essay, “The Ends of Man,” “Ousia and Grammē: Note on a Note from Being and Time,” “White Mythology,” (on the essential metaphoricity of language), and “Signature Event Context,” known for spawning the famous debate with John Searle over the work of J.L. Austin.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Of Grammatology. Translated by Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak. Baltimore and London: The JohnsHopkinsUniversity Press, 1974.
    • This book is one from the 1967 publication blitz, and is probably Derrida’s most famous work, among philosophers and non-philosophers alike. In addition, it is really one of the only book-length pieces Derrida wrote that is (at least the first part), merely programmatic and expository, as opposed to the prolonged engagements he typically undertakes with a particular text or thinker (the second part of the book is such an engagement, primarily with the thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau). In this book we get extended discussions of the history of metaphysics, logocentrism, the privilege of voice over writing in the tradition, différance, trace, and supplementarity. It is also in this text that the infamous quote, “There is no outside-text,” is found.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Positions. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This book is from the 1972 group, and is a very short collection of interviews. It is highly recommended as a good starting-point for those approaching Derrida for the first time. Here Derrida lays out in very straightforward, programmatic terms, the stakes of the deconstructive project, unencumbered by deep textual analysis.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Voice and Phenomenon. Trans. Leonard Lawlor. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2011.
    • This is probably the single most important book that Derrida wrote. It is, like most of the rest of his work, a textual engagement with Husserl. Nevertheless, Derrida concentrates on a few key passages of Husserl’s works, most of which are cited in the body of Derrida’s work, such that a very basic knowledge of the Husserlian project makes reading Derrida’s text quite possible. It is in his engagement with Husserl, and the deconstruction of consciousness, that Derrida formulates the key concepts of différancetrace, and supplementarity, that will govern the direction of his work for most of the rest of his career. Derrida himself claims (in Positions) that this is his favorite of his books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Writing and Difference. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1978.
    • This book is from the 1967 publication blitz, and it is a collection of Derrida’s early essays up through the mid-1960s. Here we get a very important essay on Michel Foucault that spawned the bitter fallout between the two for many years, the essay on Emmanuel Levinas that reoriented Levinas’ thinking, as well as demonstrated the broad and deep knowledge that Derrida had of the phenomenological tradition. In addition, this essay, “Violence and Metaphysics,” highlights the important role that Levinas will play in Derrida’s own thinking. There is also a very important essay on Freud and the trace, which is contemporaneous with the writing of Voice and Phenomenon.

b. Secondary Sources

There are many terrific volumes of secondary material on these two thinkers, but here are selected a few of the most relevant with respect to the themes explored in this article.

  • Bell, Jeffrey A. Philosophy at the Edge of Chaos. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2006.
  • Bell, Jeffrey A. The Problem of Difference: Phenomenology and Poststructuralism. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1998.
    • Both of Bell’s books deal with the question of difference, and situate, primarily Deleuze but Derrida as well, within the larger context of the history of philosophical attempts to think about difference, including Plato, Aristotle, Whitehead, Descartes, and Kant.
  • Bogue, Ronald. Deleuze and Guattari. London and New York: Routledge, 1989.
    • Bogue’s text was one of the earlier attempts to write a comprehensive introductory text that took into account Deleuze’s historical engagements, along with his own philosophical articulations of his concepts, and the later political and aesthetic texts as well. This text is still a ‘standard’.
  • Bryant, Levi. Difference and Givenness: Deleuze’s Transcendental Empiricism and the Ontology of Immanence. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2008.
    • Bryant’s is one of the best books on Deleuze in recent years. It focuses primarily on Difference and Repetition, but examines the concept of transcendental empiricism, what it means to attempt to think the conditions of real experience, through the lens of Deleuze’s previous interactions with the thinkers who informed the research of Difference and Repetition.
  • De Beistigui, Miguel. Truth and Genesis: Philosophy as Differential Ontology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2004.
    • De Beistigui, whose early works centered on the philosophy of Martin Heidegger, argues in this book that Deleuze completes the Heideggerian attempt to think difference, in that it is Deleuze who overcomes the humanism that Heidegger never quite escapes.
  • Descombes, Vincent. Modern French Philosophy. Trans. L. Scott-Fox and J.M. Harding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
    • Descombes’ book was one of the first to attempt to capture the heart of French philosophy in the wake of Bergson. It is still one of the best, especially given its brevity. Chapters 5 and 6 are particularly relevant.
  • Gasché, Rodolphe. The Tain of the Mirror: Derrida and the Philosophy of Reflection. Cambridge and London: HarvardUniversity Press, 1986.
    • Gasché’s text was one of the earliest and most forceful attempts to situate Derrida’s thinking in the context of an explicit philosophical problem, the problem of critical reflection, complete with a long philosophical history. In the Anglophone world, Derrida’s work was at this time explored mostly in the context of Literary Theory departments. While that gave Derrida something of a ‘head start’ over the reception of Deleuze in the United States, it also created the unfortunate impression, throughout academic philosophy, that Derrida’s project was one of merely ‘playing’ with canonical texts. Gasché’s book corrected that misconception, and to this day it remains one of the best texts for understanding the overall thrust of Derrida’s project.
  • Hägglund, Martin. Radical Atheism: Derrida and the Time of Life. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2008.
    • Hägglund’s book enters into the oft-discussed theme of Derrida’s so-called religious turn in his later period. It is one of the best recent books on Derrida’s thinking, taking up the implications of a fully immanent analysis of temporality.
  • Hughes, Joe. Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation. London: Continuum International Publishing Group, 2008.
    • This book is one of the first to take up a close comparison of Deleuze with the philosophy of Husserl, boldly arguing that Deleuze’s project is marked from start to finish with a certain phenomenological impetus.
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomenology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2002.
    • Lawlor was one of the first American scholars to emphasize the centrality of Husserl to Derrida’s work. This book is particularly helpful because, inasmuch as it deals with the entirety of Derrida’s engagement with Husserl (from 1953 up through Voice and Phenomenon and beyond), it provides a rigorous but accessible explication of the early formation of Derrida’s project. It is without question one of the best books on Derrida available.
  • Marrati, Paola. Genesis and Trace: Derrida Reading Husserl and Heidegger. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2005.
    • This book, first published in French in 1998, explores the origins of the deconstructive project in Derrida’s engagement with the phenomenological tradition, and more specifically, with the question of time. It demonstrates and articulates the lasting significance of the Husserlian problematic up through Derrida’s immersion into Heidegger’s thought, and beyond.
  • Smith, Daniel W. Essays on Deleuze. Edinburgh: EdinburghUniversity Press, 2012.
    • Smith has for years been one of the leading voices in the world when it comes to Deleuze, and this 2012 volume at last collects all of his most important essays on Deleuze, along with a few new ones. Of particular interest is the essay on the simulacrum, the one on univocity, the one on the conditions of the new, and the comparative essay on Deleuze and Derrida.

c. Other Sources Cited in this Article

  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 1. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 2. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Duns Scotus. Philosophical Writings—A Selection. Trans. Allan B. Wolter. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1987.
  • Heraclitus. Fragments: A Text and Translation with a Commentary By T.M. Robinson. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1987.
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Author Information

Vernon W. Cisney
Gettysburg College
U. S. A.

Michel Foucault: Political Thought

The work of twentieth-century French philosopher Michel Foucault has increasingly influenced the study of politics. This influence has mainly been via concepts he developed in particular historical studies that have been taken up as analytical tools; “governmentality” and ”biopower” are the most prominent of these. More broadly, Foucault developed a radical new conception of social power as forming strategies embodying intentions of their own, above those of individuals engaged in them; individuals for Foucault are as much products of as participants in games of power.

The question of Foucault’s overall political stance remains hotly contested. Scholars disagree both on the level of consistency of his position over his career, and the particular position he could be said to have taken at any particular time. This dispute is common both to scholars critical of Foucault and to those who are sympathetic to his thought.

What can be generally agreed about Foucault is that he had a radically new approach to political questions, and that novel accounts of power and subjectivity were at its heart. Critics dispute not so much the novelty of his views as their coherence. Some critics see Foucault as effectively belonging to the political right because of his rejection of traditional left-liberal conceptions of freedom and justice. Some of his defenders, by contrast, argue for compatibility between Foucault and liberalism. Other defenders see him either as a left-wing revolutionary thinker, or as going beyond traditional political categories.

To summarize Foucault’s thought from an objective point of view, his political works would all seem to have two things in common: (1) an historical perspective, studying social phenomena in historical contexts, focusing on the way they have changed throughout history; (2) a discursive methodology, with the study of texts, particularly academic texts, being the raw material for his inquiries. As such the general political import of Foucault’s thought across its various turns is to understand how the historical formation of discourses have shaped the political thinking and political institutions we have today.

Foucault’s thought was overtly political during one phase of his career, coinciding exactly with the decade of the 1970s, and corresponding to a methodology he designated “genealogy”. It is during this period that, alongside the study of discourses, he analysed power as such in its historical permutations. Most of this article is devoted to this period of Foucault’s work. Prior to this, during the 1960s, the political content of his thought was relatively muted, and the political implications of that thought are contested. So, this article is divided into thematic sections arranged in order of the chronology of their appearance in Foucault’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Foucault’s Early Marxism
  2. Archaeology
  3. Genealogy
  4. Discipline
  5. Sexuality
  6. Power
  7. Biopower
  8. Governmentality
  9. Ethics
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary
    2. Secondary

1. Foucault’s Early Marxism

Foucault began his career as a Marxist, having been influenced by his mentor, the Marxist philosopher Louis Althusser, as a student to join the French Communist Party. Though his membership was tenuous and brief, Foucault’s later political thought should be understood against this background, as a thought that is both under the influence of, and intended as a reaction to, Marxism.

Foucault himself tells us that after his early experience of a Stalinist communist party, he felt sick of politics, and shied away from political involvements for a long time. Still, in his first book, which appeared in 1954, less than two years after Foucault had left the Party, his theoretical perspective remained Marxist. This book was a history of psychology, published in English as Mental Illness and Psychology. In the original text, Foucault concludes that mental illness is a result of alienation caused by capitalism. However, he excised this Marxist content from a later edition in 1962, before suppressing publication of the book entirely; an English translation of the 1962 edition continues to be available only by an accident of copyright (MIP vii). Thus, one can see a trajectory of Foucault’s decisively away from Marxism and indeed tendentially away from politics.

2. Archaeology

Foucault’s first major, canonical work was his 1961 doctoral dissertation, The History of Madness. He gives here a historical account, repeated in brief in the 1962 edition of Mental Illness and Psychology, of what he calls the constitution of an experience of madness in Europe, from the fifteenth to the nineteenth centuries. This encompasses correlative study of institutional and discursive changes in the treatment of the mad, to understand the way that madness was constituted as a phenomenon. The History of Madness is Foucault’s longest book by some margin, and contains a wealth of material that he expands on in various ways in much of his work of the following two decades. Its historical inquiry into the interrelation of institutions and discourses set the pattern for his political works of the 1970s.

Foucault saw there as being three major shifts in the treatment of madness in the period under discussion. The first, with the Renaissance, saw a new respect for madness. Previously, madness had been seen as an alien force to be expelled, but now madness was seen as a form of wisdom. This abruptly changed with the beginning of the Enlightenment in the seventeenth century. Now rationality was valorized above all else, and its opposite, madness, was excluded completely. The unreasonable was excluded from discourse, and congenitally unreasonable people were physically removed from society and confined in asylums. This lasted until the end of the eighteenth century, when a new movement “liberating” the mad arose. For Foucault, however, this was no true liberation, but rather the attempt by Enlightenment reasoning to finally negate madness by understanding it completely, and cure it with medicine.

The History of Madness thus takes seriously the connection between philosophical discourse and political reality. Ideas about reason are not merely taken to be abstract concerns, but as having very real social implications, affecting every facet of the lives of thousands upon thousands of people who were considered mad, and indeed, thereby, altering the structure of society. Such a perspective represents a change in respect of Foucault’s former Marxism. Rather than attempt to ground experience in material circumstances, here it might seem that cultural transformation is being blamed for the transformation of society. That is, it might seem that Foucault had embraced idealism, the position that ideas are the motor force of history, Marxism’s opposite. This would, however, be a misreading. The History of Madness posits no causal priority, either of the cultural shift over the institutional, or vice versa. It simply notes the coincident transformation, without etiological speculation. Moreover, while the political forces at work in the history of madness were not examined by Foucault in this work, it is clearly a political book, exploring the political stakes of philosophy and medicine.

Many were convinced that Foucault was an idealist, however, by later developments in his thought. After The History of Madness, Foucault began to focus on the discursive, bracketing political concerns almost entirely. This was first, and most clearly, signalled in the preface to his next book, The Birth of the Clinic. Although the book itself essentially extends The History of Madness chronologically and thematically, by examining the birth of institutional medicine from the end of the eighteenth century, the preface is a manifesto for a new methodology that will attend only to discourses themselves, to the language that is uttered, rather than the institutional context. It is the following book in Foucault’s sequence, rather than The Birth of the Clinic itself, that carried this intention to fulfilment: this book was The Order of Things (1966). Whereas in The History of Madness and The Birth of the Clinic, Foucault had pursued historical researches that had been relatively balanced between studying conventional historical events, institutional change, and the history of ideas, The Order of Things represented an abstract history of thought that ignored almost anything outside the discursive. This method was in effect what was at that time in France called “structuralism,” though Foucault was never happy with this use of this term. His specific claims were indeed quite unique, namely that in the history of academic discourses, in a given epoch, knowledge is organized by an episteme, which governs what kind of statements can be taken as true. The Order of Things charts several successive historical shifts of episteme in relation to the human sciences.

These claims led Foucault onto a collision with French Marxism. This could not have been entirely unintended by Foucault, in particular because in the book he specifically accuses Marxism of being a creature of the nineteenth century that was now obsolete. He also concluded the work by indicating his opposition to humanism, declaring that “man” (the gendered “man” here refers to a concept that in English we have come increasingly to call the “human”) as such was perhaps nearing obsolescence. Foucault here was opposing a particular conception of the human being as a sovereign subject who can understand itself. Such humanism was at that time the orthodoxy in French Marxism and philosophy, championed the pre-eminent philosopher of the day, Jean-Paul Sartre, and upheld by the French Communist Party’s central committee explicitly against Althusser just a month before The Order of Things was published (DE1 36). In its humanist form, Marxism cast itself as a movement for the full realization of the individual. Foucault, by contrast, saw the notion of the individual as a recent and aberrant idea. Furthermore, his entire presumption to analyse and criticize discourses without reference to the social and economic system that produced them seemed to Marxists to be a massive step backwards in analysis. The book indeed seems to be apolitical: it refuses to take a normative position about truth, and accords no importance to anything outside abstract, academic discourses. The Order of Things proved so controversial, its claims so striking, that it became a best-seller in France, despite being a lengthy, ponderous, scholarly tome.

Yet, Foucault’s position is not quite as anti-political as has been imagined. The explicit criticism of Marxism in the book was specifically of Marx’s economic doctrine: it amounts to the claim that this economics is essentially a form of nineteenth century political economy. It is thus not a total rejection of Marxism, or dismissal of the importance of economics. His anti-humanist position was not in itself anti-Marxist, inasmuch as Althusser took much the same line within a Marxist framework, albeit one that tended to challenge basic tenets of Marxism, and which was rejected by the Marxist establishment. This shows it is possible to use the criticism of the category of “man” in a pointedly political way. Lastly, the point of Foucault’s “archaeological” method of investigation, as he now called it, of looking at transformations of discourses in their own terms without reference to the extra-discursive, does not imply in itself that discursive transformations can be explained without reference to anything non-discursive, only that they can be mapped without any such reference. Foucault thus shows a lack of interest in the political, but no outright denial of the importance of politics.

Foucault was at this time fundamentally oriented towards the study of language. This should not in itself be construed as apolitical. There was a widespread intellectual tendency in France during the 1960s to focus on avant-garde literature as being the main repository for radical hopes, eclipsing a traditional emphasis on the politics of the working class. Foucault wrote widely during this period on art and literature, publishing a book on the obscure French author Raymond Roussel, which appeared on the same day as The Birth of the Clinic. Given Roussel’s eccentricity, this was not far from his reflections on literature in The History of Madness. For Foucault, modern art and literature are essentially transgressive. Transgression is something of a common thread running through Foucault’s work in the 1960s: the transgression of madness and literary modernism is for Foucault directly implicated in the challenge he sees emerging to the current episteme. This interest in literature culminated in what is perhaps Foucault’s best known piece in this relation, ”What Is an Author?”, which combines some of the themes from his final book of the sixties, The Archaeology of Knowledge, with reflections on modern literature in challenging the notion of the human “author” of a work in whatever genre. All of these works, no matter how abstract, can be seen as having important political-cultural stakes for Foucault. Challenging the suzerainty of “man” can in itself be said to have constituted his political project during this period, such was the importance he accorded to discourses. The practical importance of such questions can be seen in The History of Madness.

Foucault was ultimately dissatisfied with this approach, however. The Archaeology of Knowledge, a reflective consideration of the methodology of archaeology itself, ends with an extraordinary self-critical dialogue, in which Foucault answers imagined objections to this methodology.

3. Genealogy

Foucault wrote The Archaeology of Knowledge while based in Tunisia, where he had taken a three-year university appointment in 1966. While the book was in its final stages, the world around him changed. Tunisia went through a political upheaval, with demonstrations against the government, involving many of his students. He was drawn into supporting them, and was persecuted as a result. Much better known and more significant student demonstrations occurred in Paris shortly afterwards, in May of 1968. Foucault largely missed these because he was in Tunis, but he followed news of them keenly.

He returned to France permanently in 1969. He was made the head of the philosophy department at a brand new university at Vincennes. The milieu he found on his return to France was itself highly politicized, in stark contrast to the relatively staid country he had left behind three years before. He was surrounded by peers who had become committed militants, not least his partner Daniel Defert, and including almost all of the colleagues he had hired to his department. He now threw himself into an activism that would characterize his life from that point on.

It was not long before a new direction appeared in his thought to match. The occasion this first became apparent was his 1970 inaugural address for another new job, his second in as many years, this time as a professor at the Collège de France, the highest academic institution in France. This address was published as a book in France, L’ordre du discours, “The Order of Discourse” (which is one of the multiple titles under which it has been translated in English). For the first time, Foucault sets out an explicit agenda of studying institutions alongside discourse. He had done this in the early 1960s, but now he proposed it as a deliberate method, which he called “genealogy.” Much of “The Order of Discourse” in effect recapitulates Foucault’s thought up to that point, the considerations of the history of madness and the regimes of truth that have governed scientific discourse, leading to a sketch of a mode of analysing discourse similar to that of The Archeology of Knowledge. In the final pages, however, Foucault states that he will now undertake analyses in two different directions, critical and “genealogical.” The critical direction consists in the study of the historical formation of systems of exclusion. This is clearly a turn back to the considerations of The History of Madness. The genealogical direction is more novel – not only within Foucault’s work, but in Western thought in general, though the use of the term “genealogical” does indicate a debt to one who came before him, namely Friedrich Nietzsche. The genealogical inquiry asks about the reciprocal relationship between systems of exclusion and the formation of discourses. The point here is that exclusion is not a fate that befalls innocent, pre-existing discourses. Rather, discourses only ever come about within and because of systems of exclusion, the negative moment of exclusion co-existing with the positive moment of the production of discourse. Now, discourse becomes a political question in a full sense for Foucault, as something that is intertwined with power.

“Power” is barely named as such by Foucault in this text, but it becomes the dominant concept of his output of the 1970s. This output comprises two major books, eight annual lecture series he gave at the Collège de France, and a plethora of shorter pieces and interviews. The signature concept of genealogy, combining the new focus on power with the older one on discourse, is his notion of “power-knowledge.” Foucault now sees power and knowledge as indissolubly joined, such that one never has either one without the other, with neither having causal suzerainty over the other.

His first lecture series at the Collège de France, now published in French as Leçons sur la volonté de savoir (“Lessons on the will to knowledge”), extends the concerns of “The Order of Discourse” with the production of knowledge. More overtly political material followed in the next two lecture series, between 1971 and 1973, both of which dealt with the prison system, and led up to Foucault’s first full-scale, published genealogy, 1975’s Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison.

4. Discipline

This research on prisons began in activism. The French state had banned several radical leftist groups in the aftermath of May 1968, and thousands of their members ended up in prisons, where they began to agitate for political rights for themselves, then began to agitate for rights for prisoners in general, having been exposed by their incarceration to ordinary prisoners and their problems. Foucault was the main organizer of a group formed outside the prison, in effect as an outgrowth of this struggle, the Groupe d’informations sur les prisons (the GIP – the Prisons Information Group). This group, composed primarily of intellectuals, sought simply to empower prisoners to speak of their experiences on their own account, by sending surveys out to them and collating their responses.

In tandem with this effort, Foucault researched the history of the prisons, aiming to find out something that the prisoners themselves could not tell him: how the prison system had come into being and what purpose it served in the broader social context. His history of the prisons turns out to be a history of a type of power that Foucault calls “disciplinary,” which encompasses the modern prison system, but is much broader. Discipline and Punish thus comprises two main historical theses. One, specifically pertaining to the prison system, is that this system regularly produces an empirically well-known effect, a layer of specialized criminal recidivists. This is for Foucault simply what prisons objectively do. Pointing this out undercuts the pervasive rationale of imprisonment that prisons are there to reduce crime by punishing and rehabilitating inmates. Foucault considers the obvious objection to this that prisons only produce such effects because they have been run ineffectively throughout their history, that better psychological management of rehabilitation is required, in particular. He answers this by pointing out that such discourses of prison reform have accompanied the prison system since it was first established, and are hence part of its functioning, indeed propping it up in spite of its failures by providing a constant excuse for its failings by arguing that it can be made to work differently.

Foucault’s broader thesis in Discipline and Punish is that we are living in a disciplinary society, of which the prison is merely a potent example. Discipline began not with the prisons, but originally in monastic institutions, spreading out through society via the establishment of professional armies, which required dressage, the training of individual soldiers in their movements so that they could coordinate with one another with precision. This, crucially, was a matter of producing what Foucault calls “docile bodies,” the basic unit of disciplinary power. The prison is just one of a raft of broadly similar disciplinary institutions that come into existence later. Schools, hospitals, and factories all combine similar methods to prisons for arranging bodies regularly in space, down to their minute movements. All combine moreover similar functions. Like the prison, they all have educational, economically productive, and medical aspects to them. The differences between these institutions is a matter of which aspect has primacy.

All disciplinary institutions also do something else that is quite novel, for Foucault: they produce a “soul” on the basis of the body, in order to imprison the body. This eccentric formulation of Foucault’s is meant to capture the way that disciplinary power has increasingly individualized people. Discipline and Punish begins with a vivid depiction of an earlier form of power in France, specifically the execution in 1757 of a man who had attempted to kill the King of France. As was the custom, for this, the most heinous of crimes in a political system focused on the person of the king, the most severe punishment was meted out: the culprit was publicly tortured to death. Foucault contrasts this with the routinized imprisonment that became the primary form of punishing criminals in the 19th century. From a form of power that punished by extraordinary and exemplary physical harm against a few transgressors, Western societies adopted a form of power that attempted to capture all individual behaviour. This is illustrated by a particular example that has become one of the best known images from Foucault’s work, the influential scheme of nineteenth century philosopher Jeremy Bentham called the “Panopticon,” a prison in which every action of the inmates would be visible. This serves as something of a paradigm for the disciplinary imperative, though it was never realized completely in practice.

Systems of monitoring and control nevertheless spread through all social institutions: schools, workplaces, and the family. While criminals had in a sense already been punished individually, they were not treated as individuals in the full sense that now developed. Disciplinary institutions such as prisons seek to develop detailed individual psychological profiles of people, and seek to alter their behaviour at the same level. Where previously most people had been part of a relatively undifferentiated mass, individuality being the preserve of a prominent or notorious few, and even then a relatively thin individuality, a society of individuals now developed, where everyone is supposed to have their own individual life story. This constitutes the soul Foucault refers to.

5. Sexuality

The thread of individualization runs through his next book, the first of what were ultimately three volumes of his History of Sexuality. He gave this volume the title The Will to Knowledge. It appeared only a year after Discipline and Punish. Still, three courses at the Collège de France intervene between his lectures on matters penitential and the book on sexuality. The first, Psychiatric Power, picks up chronologically where The History of Madness had left off, and applies Foucault’s genealogical method to the history of psychiatry. The next year, 1975, Foucault gave a series of lectures entitled Abnormal. These link together the studies on the prison with those on psychiatry and the question of sexuality through the study of the category of the abnormal, to which criminals, the mad, and sexual “perverts” were all assigned. Parts of these lectures indeed effectively reappear in The Will to Knowledge.

Like Discipline and Punish, the Will to Knowledge contains both general and specific conclusions. Regarding the specific problem of sexuality, Foucault couches his thesis as a debunking of a certain received wisdom in relation to the history of sexuality that he calls “the repressive hypothesis.” This is the view that our sexuality has historically been repressed, particularly in the nineteenth century, but that during the twentieth century it has been progressively liberated, and that we need now to get rid of our remaining hang-ups about sex by talking openly and copiously about it. Foucault allows the core historical claim that there has been sexual repressiveness, but thinks that this is relatively unimportant in the history of sexuality. Much more important, he thinks, is an injunction to talk about our sexuality that has consistently been imposed even during the years of repressiveness, and is now intensified, ostensibly for the purpose of lifting our repression. Foucault again sees a disciplinary technique at work, namely confession. This began in the Catholic confessional, with the Church spreading the confessional impulse in relation to sex throughout society in the early modern period. Foucault thinks this impulse has since been made secular, particularly under the auspices of institutional psychiatry, introducing a general compulsion for everyone to tell the truth about themselves, with their sexuality a particular focus. For Foucault, there is no such thing as sexuality apart from this compulsion. That is, sexuality itself is not something that we naturally have, but rather something that has been invented and imposed.

The implication of his genealogy of sexuality is that “sex” as we understand it is an artificial construct within this recent “device” (dispositif) of sexuality. This includes both the category of the sexual, encompassing certain organs and acts, and “sex” in the sense of gender, an implication spelt out by Foucault in his introduction to the memoirs of Herculine Barbin, a nineteenth century French hermaphrodite, which Foucault discovered and arranged to have published. Foucault’s thought, and his work on sexuality in particular, has been immensely influential in the recent “third wave” of feminist thought. The interaction of Foucault and feminism is the topic of a dedicated article elsewhere in this encyclopedia.

6. Power

The most general claim of The Will to Knowledge, and of Foucault’s entire political thought, is his answer to the question of where machinations such as sex and discipline come from. Who and what is it that is responsible for the production of criminality via imprisonment? Foucault’s answer is, in a word, “power.” That is to say that no one in particular is producing these things, but that rather they are effects generated by the interaction of power relations, which produce intentions of their own, not necessarily shared by any individuals or institutions. Foucault’s account of power is the broadest of the conclusions of The Will to Knowledge. Although similar reflections on power can be found in Discipline and Punish and in lectures and interviews of the same period, The Will to Knowledge gives his most comprehensive account of power. Foucault understands power in terms of “strategies” which are produced through the concatenation of the power relations that exist throughout society, wherever people interact. As he explains in a later text, “The Subject and Power,” which effectively completes the account of power given in The Will to Knowledge, these relations are a matter of people acting on one another to make other people act in turn. Whenever we try to influence others, this is power. However, our attempts to influence others rarely turn out the way we expect; moreover, even when they do, we have very little idea what effects our actions on others’ have more broadly. In this way, the social effects of our attempts to influence other people run quite outside of our control or ken. This effect is neatly encapsulated in a remark attributed to Foucault that we may know what we do, but we do not know what what we do does. What it does is produce strategies that have a kind of life of their own. Thus, although no one in the prison system, neither the inmates, nor the guards, nor politicians, want prisons to produce a class of criminals, this is nonetheless what the actions of all the people involved do.

Controversy around Foucault’s political views has focused on his reconception of power. Criticisms of him on this point invariably fail, however, to appreciate his true position or beg the question against it by simply restating the views he has rejected. He has been interpreted as thinking that power is a mysterious, autonomous force that exists independently of any human influence, and is so all-encompassing as to preclude any resistance to it. Foucault clearly states in The Will to Knowledge that this is not so, though it is admittedly relatively difficult to understand his position, namely that resistance to power is not outside power. The point here for Foucault is not that resistance is futile, but that power is so ubiquitous that in itself it is not an obstacle to resistance. One cannot resist power as such, but only specific strategies of power, and then only with great difficulty, given the tendency of strategies to absorb apparently contradictory tendencies. Still, for Foucault power is never conceived as monolithic or autonomous, but rather is a matter of superficially stable structures emerging on the basis of constantly shifting relations underneath, caused by an unending struggle between people. Foucault explains this in terms of the inversion of Clausewitz’s dictum that war is diplomacy by other means into the claim that “politics is war by other means.” For Foucault, apparently peaceful and civilized social arrangements are supported by people locked in a struggle for supremacy, which is eternally susceptible to change, via the force of that struggle itself.

Foucault is nevertheless condemned by many liberal commentators for his failure to make any normative distinction between power and resistance, that is, for his relativism. This accusation is well founded: he consistently eschews any kind of overtly normative stance in his thought. He thus does not normatively justify resistance, but it is not clear there is any inherent contradiction in a non-normative resistance. This idea is coherent, though of course those who think it is impossible to have a non-normative political thought (which is a consensus position within political philosophy) will reject him on this basis. For his part, he offers only analyses that he hopes will prove useful to people struggling in concrete situations, rather than prescriptions as to what is right or wrong.

One last accusation, coming from a particularly noteworthy source, the most prominent living German philosopher, Jürgen Habermas, should also be mentioned. This accusation is namely that Foucault’s account of power is “functionalist.” Functionalism in sociology means taking society as a functional whole and thus reading every part as having distinct functions. The problem with this view is that society is not designed by anyone and consequently much of it is functionally redundant or accidental. Foucault does use the vocabulary of “function” on occasion in his descriptions of the operations of power, but does not show any allegiance to or even awareness of functionalism as a school of thought. His position in any case is not that society constitutes a totality or whole via any necessity: functions exist within strategies that emerge spontaneously from below, and the functions of any element are subject to change.

7. Biopower

Foucault’s position in relation to resistance implies not so much that one is defeated before one begins as that one must proceed with caution to avoid simply supporting a strategy of power while thinking oneself rebellious. This is for him what has happened in respect of sexuality in the case of the repressive hypothesis. Though we try to liberate ourselves from sexual repression, we in fact play into a strategy of power which we do not realize exists. This strategy is for everyone to constitute themselves as “‘subjects’ in both senses of the word,” a process Foucault designates “subjection” (assujettissement). The two senses here are passive and active. On the one hand, we are subjected in this process, made into passive subjects of study by medical professionals, for example. On the other, we are the subjects in this process, having to actively confess our sexual proclivities and indeed in the process develop an identity based on this confessed sexuality. So, power operates in ways that are both overtly oppressive and more positive.

Sexuality for Foucault has a quite extraordinary importance in the contemporary network of power relations. It has become the essence of our personal identity, and sex has come to be seen as “worth dying for.” Foucault details how sexuality had its beginnings as a preoccupation of the newly dominant bourgeois class, who were obsessed with physical and reproductive health, and their own pleasure. This class produced sexuality positively, though one can see that it would have been imposed on women and children within that class quite regardless of their wishes. For Foucault, there are four consistent strategies of the device of sexuality: the pathologisation of the sexuality of women and children, the concomitant medicalization of the sexually abnormal “pervert,” and the constitution of sexuality as an object of public concern. From its beginning in the bourgeoisie, Foucault sees public health agencies as imposing sexuality more crudely on the rest of the populace, quite against their wishes.

Why has this happened? For Foucault, the main explanation is how sexuality ties together multiple “technologies of power”, namely discipline on the one hand, and a newer technology, which he calls “bio-politics,” on the other. In The Will to Knowledge, Foucault calls this combination of discipline and bio-politics together “bio-power,” though confusingly he elsewhere seems to use “bio-power” and “bio-politics” as synonyms, notably in his 1976 lecture series, Society Must Be Defended. He also elsewhere dispenses with the hyphens in these words, as it will in the present article hereafter.

Biopolitics is a technology of power that grew up on the basis of disciplinary power. Where discipline is about the control of individual bodies, biopolitics is about the control of entire populations. Where discipline constituted individuals as such, biopolitics does this with the population. Prior to the invention of biopolitics, there was no serious attempt by governments to regulate the people who lived in a territory, only piecemeal violent interventions to put down rebellions or levy taxes. As with discipline, the main precursor to biopolitics can be found in the Church, which is the institution that did maintain records of births and deaths, and did minister to the poor and sick, in the medieval period. In the modern period, the perception grew among governments that interventions in the life of the people would produce beneficial consequences for the state, preventing depopulation, ensuring a stable and growing tax base, and providing a regular supply of manpower for the military. Hence they took an active interest in the lives of the people. Disciplinary mechanisms allowed the state to do this through institutions, most notably perhaps medical institutions that allowed the state to monitor and support the health of the population. Sex was the most intense site at which discipline and biopolitics intersected, because any intervention in population via the control of individual bodies fundamentally had to be about reproduction, and also because sex is one of the major vectors of disease transmission. Sex had to be controlled, regulated, and monitored if the population was to be brought under control.

There is another technology of power in play, however, older than discipline, namely “sovereign power.” This is the technology we glimpse at the beginning of Discipline and Punish, one that works essentially by violence and by taking, rather than by positively encouraging and producing as both discipline and biopolitics do. This form of power was previously the way in which governments dealt both with individual bodies and with masses of people. While it has been replaced in these two roles by discipline and biopower, it retains a role nonetheless at the limits of biopower. When discipline breaks down, when the regulation of the population breaks down, the state continues to rely on brute force as a last resort. Moreover, the state continues to rely on brute force, and the threat of it, in dealing with what lies outside its borders.

For Foucault, there is a mutual incompatibility between biopolitics and sovereign power. Indeed, he sometimes refers to sovereign power as “thanatopolitics,” the politics of death, in contrast to biopolitics’s politics of life. Biopolitics is a form of power that works by helping you to live, thanatopolitics by killing you, or at best allowing you to live. It seems impossible for any individual to be simultaneously gripped by both forms of power, notwithstanding a possible conflict between different states or state agencies. There is a need for a dividing line between the two, between who is to be “made to live,” as Foucault puts it, and who is to be killed or simply allowed to go on living indifferently. The most obvious dividing line is the boundary between the population and its outside at the border of a territory, but the “biopolitical border,” as it has been called by recent scholars, is not the same as the territorial border. In Society Must Be Defended, Foucault suggests there is a device he calls “state racism,” that comes variably into play in deciding who is to receive the benefits of biopolitics or be exposed to the risk of death.

Foucault does not use this term in any of the works he published himself, but nevertheless does point in The Will to Knowledge to a close relationship between biopolitics and racism. Discourses of scientific racism that emerged in the nineteenth century posited a link between the sexual “degeneracy” of individuals and the hygiene of the population at large. By the early twentieth century, eugenics, the pseudo-science of improving the vitality of a population through selective breeding, was implemented to some extent in almost all industrialized countries. It of course found its fullest expression in Nazi Germany. Nevertheless, Foucault is quite clear that there is something quite paradoxical about such attempts to link the old theme of “blood” to modern concerns with population health. The essential point about “state racism” is not then that it necessarily links to what we might ordinarily understand as racism in its strict sense, but that there has to be a dividing line in modern biopolitical states between what is part of the population and what is not, and that this is, in a broad sense, racist.

8. Governmentality

After the publication of The Will to Knowledge, Foucault took a one-year hiatus from lecturing at the Collège de France. He returned in 1978 with a series of lectures that followed logically from his 1976 ones, but show a distinct shift in conceptual vocabulary. Talk of “biopolitics” is almost absent. A new concept, “governmentality,” takes its place. The lecture series of 1978 and 1979, Security, Territory, Population and The Birth of Biopolitics, center on this concept, despite the somewhat misleading title of the latter in this regard.

“Governmentality” is a portmanteau word, derived from the phrase “governmental rationality.” A governmentality is thus a logic by which a polity is governed. But this logic is for Foucault, in keeping with his genealogical perspective (which he still affirms), not merely ideal, but rather encompasses institutions, practices and ideas. More specifically, Foucault defines governmentality in Security, Territory, Population as allowing for a complex form of “power which has the population as its target, political economy as its major form of knowledge, and apparatuses of security as its essential technical instrument” (pp. 107–8). Confusingly, however, Foucault in the same breath also defines other senses in which he will use the term “governmentality.” He will use it not only to describe this recent logic of government, but as the longer tendency in Western history that has led to it, and the specific process in the early modern period by which modern governmentality was formed.

“Governmentality” is a slippery concept then. Still, it is an important one. Governmentality seems to be closely contemporaneous and functionally isomorphic with biopolitics, hence seems to replace it in Foucault’s thought. That said, unlike biopolitics, it never figures in a major publication of his – he only allowed one crucial lecture of Security, Territory, Population to be published under the title of “Governmentality,” in an Italian journal. It is via the English translation of this essay that this concept has become known in English, this one essay of Foucault’s in fact inspiring an entire school of sociological reflection.

What is the meaning of this fuzzy concept then? Foucault never repudiates biopower. During these lectures he on multiple occasions reaffirms his interest in biopower as an object of study, and does so as late as 1983, the year before he died. The meaning of governmentality as a concept is to situate biopower in a larger historical moment, one that stretches further back in history and encompasses more elements, in particular the discourses of economics and regulation of the economy.

Foucault details two main phases in the development of governmentality. The first is what he identifies as raison d’État, literally “reason of state.” This is the central object of study of Security, Territory, Population. It correlates the technology of discipline, as an attempt to regulate society to the fullest extent, with what was contemporaneously called “police.” This governmentality gave way by the eighteenth century to a new form of governmentality, what will become political liberalism, which reacts against the failures of governmental regulation with the idea that society should be left to regulate itself naturally, with the power of police applied only negatively in extremis. This for Foucault is broadly the governmentality that has lasted to this day, and is the object of study of The Birth of Biopolitics in its most recent form, what is called “neo-liberalism.” With this governmentality, we see freedom of the individual and regulation of the population subtly intertwined.

9. Ethics

The 1980s see a significant turn in Foucault’s work, both in terms of the discourses he attends to and the vocabulary he uses. Specifically, he focuses from now on mainly on Ancient texts from Greece and Rome, and prominently uses the concepts of “subjectivity” and “ethics.” None of these elements is entirely new to his work, but they assume novel prominence and combination at this point.

There is an article elsewhere in this encyclopedia about Foucault’s ethics. The question here is what the specifically political import of this ethics is. It is often assumed that the meaning of Foucault’s ethics is to retract his earlier political thought and thus to recant on that political project, retreating from political concerns towards a concern with individual action. There is a grain of truth to such allegations, but no more than a grain. While certainly Foucault’s move to the consideration of ethics is a move away from an explicitly political engagement, there is no recantation or contradiction of his previous positions, only the offering of an account of subjectivity and ethics that might enrich these.

Foucault’s turn towards subjectivity is similar to his earlier turn towards power: he seeks to add a dimension to the accounts and approach he has built up. As in the case of power, he does so not by helping himself to an available approach, but by producing a new one: Foucault’s own account of subjectivity is original and quite different to the extant accounts of subjectivity he rejected in his earlier work. Subjectivity for Foucault is a matter of people’s ability to shape their own conduct. In this way, his account relates to his previous work on government, with subjectivity a matter of the government of the self. It is thus closely linked to his political thought, as a question of the power that penetrates the interior of the person.

“Ethics” too is understood in this terms. Foucault does not produce an “ethics” in the sense that the word is conventionally used today to mean a normative morality, nor indeed does he produce a “political philosophy” in the sense that that phrase is conventionally used, which is to say a normative politics. “Ethics” for Foucault is rather understood etymologically by reference to Ancient Greek reflection on the ethike, which is to say, on character. Ancient Greek ethics was marked by what Foucault calls the “care of the self”: it is essentially a practice of fashioning the self. In such practices, Foucault sees a potential basis for resistance to power, though he is clear that no truly ethical practices exist today and it is by no means clear that they can be reestablished. Ethics has, on the contrary, been abnegated by Christianity with its mortificatory attitude to the self. This account of ethics can be found primarily in Foucault’s last three lecture series at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject, The Government of the Self and Others and The Courage of the Truth.

10. References and Further Reading

English translations of works by Foucault named above, in the order they were originally written.

a. Primary

    • Mental illness and psychology. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987.
    • The History of Madness. London: Routledge, 2006.
    • Birth of the Clinic. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • The Order of Things. London: Tavistock, 1970.
    • The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon, 1972.
    • "The order of discourse," in M. Shapiro, ed., Language and politics (Blackwell, 1984), pp. 108-138. Translated by Ian McLeod.
    • Psychiatric Power. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2006.
    • Discipline and Punish. London: Allen Lane, 1977.
    • Abnormal. London: Verso, 2003.
    • Society Must Be Defended. New York: Picador, 2003.
    • An Introduction. Vol. 1 of The History of Sexuality. New York: Pantheon, 1978. Reprinted as The Will to Knowledge, London: Penguin, 1998.
    • Security, Territory, Population. New York: Picador, 2009
    • The Birth of Biopolitics. New York: Picador, 2010
    • "Introduction" M. Foucault, ed., Herculine Barbin: being the recently discovered memoirs of a nineteenth-century French hermaphrodite Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980, pp. vii-xvii. Translated by Richard McDougall.
    • “The Subject and Power,” J. Faubion, ed., Power. New York: New Press, 2000, pp. 326-348.
    • The Hermeneutics of the Subject. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
    • The Government of the Self and Others. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2010.
    • The Courage of the Truth. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2011.

The shorter writings and interviews of Foucault are also of extraordinary interest, particularly to philosophers. In French, these have been published in an almost complete collection, Dits et écrits, by Gallimard, first in four volumes and more recently in a two-volume edition. In English, Foucault’s shorter works are spread across many overlapping anthologies, which even between them omit much that is important. The most important of these anthologies for Foucault’s political thought are:

  • J. Faubion, ed., Power Vol. 3, Essential Works. New York: New Press, 2000.
  • Colin Gordon, ed., Power/Knowledge. Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980.

b. Secondary

  • Graham Burchell, Colin Gordon and Peter Miller (eds.), The Foucault Effect. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1991.
    • An edited collection that is a mixture of primary and secondary sources. Both parts of the book have been extraordinarily influential. If constitutes a decent primer on governmentality.
  • Gilles Deleuze, Foucault. Trans. Seán Hand. London: Athlone, 1988.
    • The best book about Foucault’s work, from one who knew him. Though predictably idiosyncratic, it is still a pointedly political reading.
  • David Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: A Critical Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
    • An excellent selection of critical essays, mostly specifically political.
  • Mark G. E. Kelly, The Political Philosophy of Michel Foucault. New York: Routledge, 2009.
    • A comprehensive treatment of Foucault’s political thought from a specifically philosophical angle
  • John Rajchman, Michel Foucault: The Freedom of Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An idiosyncratic reading of Foucault that is particularly good at synthesising his entire career according to the political animus behind it.
  • Jon Simons, Foucault and the Political. London: Routledge, 1995.
    • The first work to focus on Foucault’s thought from a political introduction, this survey of his work serves well as a general introduction to the topic, though it necessarily lacks consideration of much that has appeared in English since its publication.
  • Barry Smart (ed.), Michel Foucault: Critical Assessments (multi-volume). London: Routledge, 1995.
    • Includes multiple sections on Foucault’s political thought.

Author Information

Mark Kelly
Middlesex University
United Kingdom


By its broadest definition, the term ‘Neo-Kantianism’ names any thinker after Kant who both engages substantively with the basic ramifications of his transcendental idealism and casts their own project at least roughly within his terminological framework. In this sense, thinkers as diverse as Schopenhauer, Mach, Husserl, Foucault, Strawson, Kuhn, Sellers, Nancy, Korsgaard, and Friedman could loosely be considered Neo-Kantian. More specifically, ‘Neo-Kantianism’ refers to two multifaceted and internally-differentiated trends of thinking in the late Nineteenth and early Twentieth-Centuries: the Marburg School and what is usually called either the Baden School or the Southwest School. The most prominent representatives of the former movement are Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, and Ernst Cassirer. Among the latter movement are Wilhelm Windelband and Heinrich Rickert. Several other noteworthy thinkers are associated with the movement as well.

Neo-Kantianism was the dominant philosophical movement in German universities from the 1870's until the First World War. Its popularity declined rapidly thereafter even though its influences can be found on both sides of the Continental/Analytic divide throughout the twentieth century. Sometimes unfairly cast as narrowly epistemological, Neo-Kantianism covered a broad range of themes, from logic to the philosophy of history, ethics, aesthetics, psychology, religion, and culture. Since then there has been a relatively small but philosophically serious effort to reinvigorate further historical study and programmatic advancement of this often neglected philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Proto Neo-Kantians
  2. Marburg
  3. Baden
  4. Associated Members
  5. Legacy
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Principle Works by Neo-Kantians and Associated Members
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Proto Neo-Kantians

During the first half of the Nineteenth-Century, Kant had become something of a relic. This is not to say that major thinkers were not strongly influenced by Kantian philosophy. Indeed there are clear traces in the literature of the Weimar Classicists, in the historiography of Bartold Georg Niebuhr (1776-1831) and Leopold von Ranke (1795-1886), in Wilhelm von Humboldt's philosophy of language (1767-1835), and in Johannes Peter Müller's (1801-1858) physiology. Figures like Schleiermacher (1768-1834), Immanuel Hermann Fichte (1796-1879), Friedrich Eduard Beneke (1798-1854), Christian Hermann Weiße (1801-1866), the Fries-influenced Jürgen Bona Meyer (1829-1897), the Frenchman Charles Renouvier (1815-1903), the evangelical theologian Albrecht Ritschl (1822-1889), and the great historian of philosophy Friedrich Ueberweg (1826-1871), made calls to heed Kant’s warning about transgressing the bounds of possible experience. However, there was neither a systematic nor programmatic school of Kantian thought in Germany for more than sixty years after Kant's death in 1804.

The first published use of the term 'Neo-Kantianer' appeared in 1862, in a polemical review of Eduard Zeller by the Hegelian Karl Ludwig Michelet. But it was Otto Liebmann’s (1840-1912) Kant und die Epigonen (1865) that most indelibly heralds the rise of a new movement. Here Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), Hegel (1770-1831), and Schelling (1775-1854), whose idealist followers held sway in German philosophy departments during the early decades of the 19th Century, are chided for taking over only Kant’s system-building, and for doing so only in a superficial way. They sought to create the world from scratch, as it were, by finding new, more-fundamental first principles upon which to create a stronghold of interlocking propositions, one following necessarily from its predecessor. Insofar as those principles were generated from reflection rather than experience, however, the ‘descendants’ would effectively embrace Kant’s idealism at the expense of his empirical realism. The steep decline of Hegelianism a generation later opened a vacuum which was to be filled by the counter-movement of scientific materialism, represented by figures like Karl Vogt (1817-1895), Heinrich Czolbe (1819-1873), and Ludwig Büchner (1824-1899). By reducing speculative philosophy to a system of naturalistic observation consistent with their realism, the materialists utilized a commonsense terminology that reopened philosophical inquiry for those uninitiated in idealist dialectics. Despite their successes in the realm of the natural sciences, the materialists were accused of avoiding serious philosophical problems rather than solving them. This was especially true about matters of consciousness and experience, which the materialists were inclined to treat unproblematically as ‘given’. Against the failings of both the idealists and the materialists, Liebmann could only repeatedly call, “Zurück zu Kant!”

The 1860’s were a sort of watershed for Neo-Kantianism, with a row of works emerging which sought to move past the idealism-materialism debate by returning to the fundamentals of the Kantian Transcendental Deduction. Eduard Zeller’s (1814-1908) Ueber Bedeutung und Aufgabe der Erkenntnishteorie (1862) placed a call similar to Liebmann’s to return to Kant, maintaining a transcendental realism in the spirit of a general epistemological critique of speculative philosophy. Kuno Fischer’s (1824-1907) Kants Leben und die Grundlagen seiner Lehre (1860), and the second volume of his Geschichte der neuern Philosophie (1860) manifested the same call, too, in what remain important commentaries on Kant’s philosophy. Fischer was at first not so concerned to advance a new philosophical system as to correctly understand the more intricate nuances of the true master. These works gained popular influence in part because of their major literary improvement upon the commentaries of Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757-1823), but in part also because of the controversy surrounding Fischer’s interpretation of Kant’s argument that space is a purely subjective facet of experience. Worried that the ideality of space led inexorably to skepticism, Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg (1802-1872) sought to retain the possibility that space was also empirically real, applicable to the things-in-themselves at least in principle. Fischer returned fire by claiming that treating space as a synthetic a posteriori would effectively annul the necessity of Newtonian science, something Fischer emphasized was at the very heart of the Kantian project. Their spirited quarrel, which enveloped a wide circumference of academics over a twenty-year span, climaxed with Trendelenburg’s highly personal Kuno Fischer und sein Kant (1869) and Fischer’s retaliatory Anti-Trendelenburg (1870). Although such personal diatribes attract popular attention, the genuine philosophical foundations of Neo-Kantianism were laid earlier.

Hermann Ludwig Ferdinand von Helmholtz (1821-94) outstripped even the scientific credentials of the materialists, combining his experimental research with a genuine philosophical sophistication and historical sensitivity. His advances in physiology, ophthalmology, audiology, electro- and thermo-dynamics duly earned him an honored place among the great German scientists. His Über die Erhaltung der Kraft (1847) ranks only behind The Origin of Species as the most influential scientific treatise of the Nineteenth-Century, even though its principle claim might have been an unattr­­­­ibuted adoption of the precedent theories by Julius Robert von Mayer (1814-1878) and James Joule (1818-1889). His major philosophical contribution was an attempt to ground Kant’s theoretical division between phenomena and noumena within empirically verifiable sense physiognomy. In place of the materialist’s faith in sense perception as a copy of reality and in advance of Kant’s general ignorance about the neurological conditions of experience, Helmholtz noted that when we see or hear something outside us there is a complicated process of neural stimulation. Experience is neither a direct projection of the perceived object onto our sense organs nor merely a conjunction of concept and sensuous intuition, but an unconscious process of symbolic inferences by which neural stimulations are made intelligible to the human mind.

The physical processes of the brain are a safer starting point, a scientifically-verifiable ground on which to explain the a priori necessity of experience, than Kant’s supra-naturalistic deduction of conceptual architectonics. Yet two key Kantian consequences are only strengthened thereby. First, experience is revealed to be nothing immediate, but a demonstrably discursive process wherein the material affect of the senses is transformed by subjective factors. Second, any inferences that can possibly be drawn about the world outside the subject must reckon with this subjective side, thereby reasserting the privileged position of epistemology above ontology. Helmholtz and the materialists both thought that Newtonian science was the best explanation of the world; but Helmholtz realized that science must take account of what Kant had claimed of it: science is the proscription of what can be demonstrated within the limits of possible experience rather than an articulation about objects in-themselves. Empirical physiognomy would more precisely proscribe those limits than purely conceptual transcendental philosophy.

Friedrich Albert Lange (1828-1875) was, at least in the Nineteenth-Century, more widely recognized as a theorist of pedagogy and advocate of Marxism in the Vereinstag deutscher Arbeitervereine than as a forerunner to Neo-Kantianism. But his influence on the Marburg school, though brief, was incisive. He took his professorship at Marburg in 1872, one year before Cohen completed his Habilitationschrift there. Lange worked with Cohen for only three years before his untimely death in 1875.

Much of Lange’s philosophy was conceived before his time in Marburg. As Privatdozent at Bonn, Lange attended Helmholtz’s lectures on the physiology of the senses, and later came to agree that the best way to move philosophy along was by combining the general Kantian insights with a more firmly founded neuro-physiology. In his masterpiece, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (1866), Lange argues that materialism is at once the best explanation of phenomena, yet quite naïve in its presumptive inference from experience to the world outside us. The argument is again taken from the progress of the physiological sciences, with Lange providing a number of experiments that reveal experience to be an aggregate construction of neural processes.

Where he progresses beyond Helmholtz is his recognition that the physiognomic processes themselves must, like every other object of experience, be understood as a product of a subject’s particular constitution. Even while denying the given-ness of sense data, Helmholtz had too often presumed to understand the processes of sensation on the basis of a non-problematic empirical realism. That is, even while Helmholtz viewed knowledge of empirical objects as an aggregate of sense physiognomy, he never sufficiently reflected on the conditions for the experience of that very sense physiognomy. So even while visual experience is regarded as derivative from the physiognomy of the eyes, optic nerves, and brain, how each of these function is considered unproblematically given to empirical experience. For Lange, we cannot so confidently infer that our experience of physiognomic processes corresponds to what is really the case outside our experience of them—that the eyes or ears actually do work as we observe them to—since the argument by which that conclusion is reached is itself physiological. Neither the senses, nor the brain, nor the empirically observable neural processes between them permit the inference that any of these is the causal grounds of our experience of them.

With such skepticism, Lange would naturally dispense, too, with attempts to ground ethical norms in either theological or rationalistic frameworks. Our normative prescriptions, however seemingly unshakeable by pure practical reason, are themselves operations of a brain, which develop contingently over great spans of evolutionary history. That brain itself is only another experienced representation, nothing which can be considered an immutable and necessary basis of which universal norms could be considered derivative. Lange thought this opened a space for creative narratives and even myths, able to inspire rather than regulate the ethical side of human behavior. Through their mutual philology teacher at Bonn, Friedrich Ritschl, Lange was also a decisive influence on the epistemology and moral-psychology of Friedrich Nietzsche.

The progenitors of Neo-Kantianism, represented principally by Liebmann, Fischer, Trendelenburg, Helmholtz, and Lange, evince a preference for Kant’s theoretical rather than ethical or aesthetical writings. While this tendency would be displaced by both the Marburg school’s social concerns and the Baden school’s concentration on the logic of values, the proto-Neo-Kantians had definite repercussions for later figures like Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933), the so-called empirio-positivists like Richard Avenarius and Ernst Mach, and the founder of the Vienna Circle, Moritz Schlick (1882-1936).

2. Marburg

Herman Cohen (1842-1918) was Lange’s friend and successor, and is usually considered the proper founder of Neo-Kantianism at Marburg. The son of a rabbi in Coswig, he was given a diverse schooling by the historian of Judaism Zacharias Frankel (1801-1875) and the philologist Jacob Bernays (1824-1881). Moving to Berlin, he studied philosophy under Trendelenburg, philology under August Boeckh (1785-1867), culture and linguistics with Heymann Steinthal (1823-1899), and physiology with Emil Du Bois-Reymond (1818-1896). One of his earliest papers, “Zur Controverse zwischen Trendelenburg und Kuno Fischer” (1871), was a sort of coming-out in academic society. Against Fischer, the attempt above all to understand the letter of Kant perfectly –even the problems that persisted in his work—was tantamount to historicizing what ought to be a living engagement with serious philosophical problems. Although roughly on the side of his teacher Trendelenburg, Cohen stood mostly on his own ground in denying that objectivity required any appeal to extra-mental objects. Granted a professorship at the University of Marburg in 1876, Cohen came to combine Kant-interpretation with Lange’s instinct to develop Kant’s thinking in light of contemporary developments: a “Verbindung der systematischen und historischen Aufgabe.” It was Cohen who published Lange’s Logische Studien (1877) posthumously and produced several new editions of his Geschichte des Materialismus. More interested in logic than science, however, Cohen took Lange’s initiatives in a decidedly epistemological direction.

Cohen’s early work consists mainly in critical engagements with Kant: Kants Theorie der Erfahrung (1871), Kants Begründung der Ethik (1877), and Kants Begründung der Aesthetik (1889). Where he progresses beyond Kant is most plainly in his attempt to overcome the Kantian dualism between intuition and discursive thinking. Cohen argues that formal a priori laws of the mind not only affect how we think about external objects, but actually constitute those objects for us. “Thinking produces that which is held to be” (Logik der reinen Erkenntnis [Berlin 1902], 67). That is, the laws of the mind not only provide the form but the content of experience, leaving Cohen with a more idealistic picture of experience than Kant’s empirical realism would have warranted. These laws lie beyond, as it were, both Kant’s conceptual categories as well as Helmholtz’s and Lange’s physiognomic processes, the latter of which Cohen considered unwarrantedly naturalistic. The transcendental conditions of experience lay in the most fundamental rules of mathematical thinking, such that metaphysics, properly understood, is the study of the laws that make possible mathematical, and by derivation, scientific thinking. While Cohen did not deny the importance of the categories of the understanding or of the necessity of sensuous processes within experience, his own advancement beyond these entailed that an object was experienced and only could be experienced in terms of the formal rules of mathematics. The nature of philosophical investigation becomes, in Cohen’s hands, neither a physiognomic investigation of the brain or senses as persistent ‘things’ nor a transcendental deduction of the concepts of the understanding and the necessary faculties of the mind, but an exposition of the a priori rules that alone make possible any and every judgment. The world itself is the measure of all possible experience.

The view had a radical implication for the notion of a Kantian self. Kant never much doubted that something persistent was the fundament on which judgment was constructed. He denied that this thing was understandable in the way either materialism or commonsense presumed, of course, but posited a transcendental unity of apperception as, at least, the logically-necessary ground for experience. Cohen replaces the ‘unity’ of a posited self, and indeed any ‘faculties’ of the mind, with a variety of ‘rules’, ‘methods’, and ‘procedures’. What we are is not a ‘thing’, but a series of logical acts. The importance of his view can be illustrated in terms of Cohen’s theoretical mathematics, especially his notions of continuity and the infinitesimally small. Neither of these is an object, obviously, in the views of materialists or empiricists. And even idealists were at pains to decipher how either could be represented. By treating both as rules for thinking rather than persistent things, Cohen was able to show their respective necessities in terms of what sorts of everyday experiences would be made impossible without them. Continuity becomes an indispensable rule for thinking about any objects in time, while the infinitesimally smallest thing becomes an indispensable rule for thinking about the composition of objects in space. Though a substantial departure from the Kantian ascription of faculties, Cohen never prided himself so much on ascertaining and propagating the conclusions of Kant as on applying Kant’s transcendental method to its sincerest conclusions.

Like his Marburg colleagues, Cohen is sometimes unfairly cast as an aloof logical hair-splitter. Quite the contrary, he was deeply engaged in ethics as well as in the social and cultural debates of his time. His approach to them is also based on a generally Kantian methodology, which he sometimes dubbed a ‘social idealism’. Dismissing the practical and applied aspects of Kant’s ethics as needlessly individualistic psychology, he stressed the importance of Kant’s project of grounding ethical laws in practical reason, therein presenting for the first time a transcendentally necessary ought. This necessity holds for humanity generally, insofar as humanity is considered generally and not in terms of the privileges or disadvantages of particular individuals. Virtues like truthfulness, honor, and justice, which relate to the concept of humanity, thus take priority over sympathy or empathy, which operate on particular individuals and their circumstances. Like both experience and ethical life, civil laws could only be justified insofar as they were necessary, in terms of their intersubjective determinability. Because class-strata effectually inculcate authoritative relationships of power, a democratic –or better— a socialist society that effaced autocratically decreed legal dicta would better fulfill Kant’s exhortation to treat people as ends rather than means, as both legislators and legislated at the same time. However, Cohen thought that then-contemporary socialist ideals put too much stock in the economic aspects of Marx’s theory, and in their place tried to instill a greater concentration on the spiritual and cultural side of human social life. Cohen’s grounding of socialism in a Kantian rather than Marxist framework thus circumvents some of its statist and materialist overtones, as Lange also tried to do in his 1865 Die Arbeiterfrage.

Hermann Cohen also remains important for his contributions to Jewish thought. In proportion to his decreasing patriotism in Germany, he became an increasingly unabashed stalwart of Judaism in his later writing, and indeed is still considered by many to be the greatest Jewish thinker of his century. After his retirement from Marburg in 1912, he taught at the Berlin Lehranstalt für die Wissenschaft des Judentums. His posthumous Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums (1919) maintains that the originally Jewish method of religious thinking –its monotheism— reveals it as a “religion of reason,” a systematic and methodological attempt to think through the mysteries of the natural world and to construct a universal system of morality ordered under a single universal divine figure. As such, religion is not simply an ornament to society or a mere expression of feelings, but an entirely intrinsic aspect of human culture. The grand summation of these various strands of his thought was to have been collated into a unified theory of culture, but only reached a planning stage before his death in 1918. Even had he completed it, Cohen’s fierce advocacy of socialism and fiercer defense of Judaism, especially in Germany, would have made an already adverse academic life increasingly difficult.

Cohen’s student Paul Natorp (1854-1924) was a trained philologist, a renowned interpreter of Plato and of Descartes, a composer, a mentor to Pasternak, Barth, and Cassirer, and an influence on the thought of Husserl, Heidegger, and Gadamer. Arriving at Marburg in 1881, much of Natorp’s career was concerned with widening the sphere of influence of Cohen’s interpretation of Kant and with tracing the historical roots of what he understood to be the essence of critical philosophy. For Natorp, too, the necessity of Neo-Kantian philosophizing lie in overcoming the speculations of the idealists and in joining philosophy again with natural science by means of limiting discourse to that which lay within the bounds of possible experience, in overcoming the Kantian dualism of intuition and discursive thinking.

However close their philosophies, Natorp stresses more indelibly the experiential side of thinking than did Cohen’s concentration on the logical features of thought. Natorp saw it as a positive advance on Kant to articulate the formal rules of scientific inquiry not as a set of axioms, but as an exposition of the rules—the methods for thinking scientifically—to the extreme that the importance of the conclusions reached by those rules becomes subsidiary to the rules themselves. Knowledge is an ‘Aufgabe’ or task, guided by logic, to make the undetermined increasingly more determined. Accordingly, the Kantian ‘thing-itself’ ceases to be an object that lies outside possible experience, but a sort of regulative ideal that of itself spurs the understanding to work towards its fulfillment. That endless call to new thinking along specifically ordered lines is just what Natorp means by scientific inquiry—a normative requirement to think further rather than a set of achieved conclusions. Thus, where Kant began with a transcendental logic in order to ground math and the natural sciences, Natorp began with the modes of thinking found already in the experimental processes of good science and the deductions of mathematics as evidence of what conditions are necessarily at play in thinking generally. The necessities of math and science do not rest, as they arguably do for Kant, upon the psychological idiosyncrasies of the rational mind, but are self-sufficient examples of what constitutes objective thinking. Thus philosophy itself, as Natorp conceived it, does not begin with the psychological functions of a rational subject and work towards its products. It begins with a critical observation of those objectively real formations—mathematical and scientific thinking—to ground how the mind itself must have worked in order to produce them.

One of the consequences of Natorp’s concentration on the continual process of methodological thinking was his acknowledgement that a proper exposition of its laws required an historical basis. Science, as the set of formal rules for thinking, begins to inquire by reflecting on why a thing is, not just that it is. Whenever that critical reflection on the methods of scientific thinking occurs, there ensues a sort of historical rebirth that generates a new cyclical age of scientific inquiry. This reflection, Natorp thought, involves rethinking how one considers that object: a genetic rather than static reflection on the changing conditions for the possibility of thinking along the lines of the continuing progress of science.

Plato’s notion of ideal forms marks the clearest occasion of –to borrow Kuhn’s designation for a similar notion—a paradigm shift. Under Natorp’s interpretation, Plato’s forms are construed not as real subsistent entities that lie beyond common human experience, but regulative hypotheses intended to guide thinking along systematic lines. No transcendent things per se, the forms are transcendental principles about the possibility of the human experience of objects. In this sense, Natorp presented Plato as a sort of Marburg Neo-Kantian avant le lettre, a view which garnered little popularity.

Like Cohen, Natorp also had significant cultural interests, and thought that the proper engagement with Kant’s thought had the potential to lead to a comprehensive philosophy of culture. Not as interested as Cohen in the philosophy of religion, it is above all in Natorp’s pedagogical writings that he espouses a social-democratic, anti-dogmatic ideal of education, the goal of which was not an orthodox body of knowledge but an attunement to the lines along which we think so as to reach knowledge. Education ought to be an awareness of the ‘Aufgabe’ of further determining the yet undetermined. Accordingly, the presentation of information in a lecture was thought to be intrinsically stilting, in comparison to the guided process of a quasi-Socratic method of question and answer. An educator of considerable skill, among his students were Karl Vorländer (1860-1928), Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950), José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955), and Boris Pasternak (1890-1960).

Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945) is usually considered the last principle figure of the Marburg school of Neo-Kantianism. Entering Marburg to study with Cohen himself in 1896, though he would never teach there, Cassirer adopted both the school’s historicist leanings and its emphasis on transcendental argumentation. Indeed, he stands as one of the last great comprehensive thinkers of the West, equal parts epistemologist, logician, philosopher of science, cultural theorist, and historian of thought. His final work, written after having immigrated to America in the wake of Nazi Germany, wove together Cohen’s defense of Judaism together with his own observations of the fascist employment of mythic symbolism to form a comprehensive critique of the Myth of the State (published posthumously in 1946). His wide interests were not accidental, but a direct consequence of his lifelong attempt to show the logical and creative aspects of human life –the Naturwissenschaften and Geisteswissenschaften— as integrally entwined within the characteristically human mode of mentality: the symbolic form.

Cassirer’s earlier historical works adopt the basic view of history promulgated by Natorp. The development of the history of ideas takes the form of naïve progresses interrupted by a series of fundamental reconsiderations of the epistemological methods that gave rise to those progresses, through Plato, Galileo, Spinoza, Leibniz, and Kant. Like Natorp, too, the progress of the history of ideas is, for Cassirer, the march of the problems and solutions constructed by the naturally progressive structure of the human mind. Despite this seemingly teleological framework, Cassirer’s histories of the Enlightenment, of Modernity, of Goethe, Rousseau, Descartes, and of epistemology are generally reliable, lucidly written expositions that aim to contextualize an author’s own thought rather than squeeze it into any particular historiographical framework. A sort of inverse of Hegel, for Cassirer the history of ideas is not reducible to an a priori necessary structure brought about by the nature of reason, but reliable evidence upon which to examine the progression of what problems arise for minds over time.

Cassirer’s historicism also led him to rethink Cohen’s notion of the subject. As Cohen thought the self was just a logical placeholder, the subject-term of the various rules of thinking, so Cassirer thought the self was a function that united the various symbolic capacities of the human mind. Yet, that set is not static. What the history of mathematics shows is not a timeless set of a priori rules that can in principle be deciphered within a philosophical logic, but a slow yet fluid shift over time. This is possible, Cassirer argued, because mathematical rules are tied neither to any experience of objects nor to any timeless notion of a context-less subject. Ways of thinking shift over time in response to wider environmental factors, and so do the mathematical and logical forms thereby. Einstein’s relativity theory, of which Cassirer was an important promulgator, underscores Cassirer’s insights especially in its assumption of non-Euclidean geometry. Put into the language of Cassirer’s mature thought, the logical model on which Einsteinian mathematics was based is itself an instantiation not of the single correct outlook on the world, but of a powerful new shift in the symbolic form of science. What Einstein accomplished was not just another theory in a world full of theories, but the remarkably concise formula for a modified way of thinking about the physical world.

The complete expression of Cassirer’s own philosophy is his three-volume Philosophie der symbolischen Formen (1923-9). In keeping with a general Kantianism, Cassirer argues that the world is not given as such in human experience, but mediated by subject-side factors. Cassirer thought that more complex structures constituted experience and the human necessity to think along certain pre-given lines. What Cassirer adds is a much greater historical sensitivity to earlier forms of human thinking as they were represented in myths and early religious expressions. The more complex and articulate forms of culture –the three major ones are language, myth, and science— are not a priori necessary across time or cultures, but are achieved by a sort of dialectical solution to problems arising when other cultural forms become unsustainable. Knowledge for Cassirer, unlike Natorp, is not so much the process of determination, but a web of psycho-linguistic relations. The human mind progresses over history through linguistic and cultural forms, from the affective expressions of primitives, to representational language, which situates objects in spatial and temporal relations, to the purely logical and mathematical forms of signification. The unique human achievement is the symbolic form, an energy of the intellect that binds a particular sensory signal to a meaningful general content. By means of symbols, humans not only navigate the world empirically and not only understand the world logically, but make the world meaningful to themselves culturally. This symbolic capacity is indeed what separates the human species from the animals. Accordingly, Cassirer saw himself as having synthesized the Neo-Kantian insights about subjectivity with the roughly Hegelian-themed phenomenology of conscious forms.

3. Baden

The intellectual pride of the Marburg school fostered a prickly relationship with their fellow neo-Kantians. The rivalry developed with the Baden Neo-Kantians (alternately named the “Southwest” school) was not so much a competition for the claim to doctrinal orthodoxy as much as what the proper aims and goals of Kant-studies should be. Although it is a generalization, where the Marburg Neo-Kantians sought clarity and methodological precision, the Baden school endeavored to explore wider applications of Kantian thought to contemporary cultural issues. Like their Marburg counterparts, they concerned themselves with offering a third, critical path between speculative idealism and materialism, but turned away from how science or mathematics were grounded in the logic of the mind toward an investigation of the human sciences and the transcendental conditions of values. While they paid greater attention to the spiritual and cultural side of human life than the Marburg school, they were less active in the practical currents of political activity.

Wilhelm Windelband (1848-1915), a student of Kuno Fischer and Hermann Lotze (1817-1881), set the tone of the school by claiming that to truly understand Kant was not a matter of philological interpretation–per Fischer—nor a return to Kant–per Liebmann—but of surpassing Kant along the very path he had blazed. Never an orthodox Kantian, he originally said "Kant verstehen, heißt über ihn hinausgehen." Part of that effort sprung from Kant’s distinction between different kinds of judgment as being appropriate to different forms of inquiry. Whereas the Marburg school’s conception of logic was steeped in Kant, Windleband found certain elements of Fichte, Hegel, and Lotze to be fruitful. Moreover, the Marburgers too-hastily applied theoretical judgment to all fields of intellectual investigation summarily, and thereby conflated the methods of natural science with proper thinking as such. This effectively relegated the so-called cultural sciences, like history, sociology, and the arts – Geisteswissenschaften – to a subsidiary intellectual rank behind logic, mathematics, and the natural science – Naturwissenschaften. Windelband thought, on the contrary, that these two areas of inquiry had a separate but equal status. To show that, Windelband needed to prove the methodological rigor of those Geisteswissenschaften, something which had been a stumbling block since the Enlightenment. In a distinctly Kantian vein, he was able to show that the conditions for the possibility of judging the content of any of the Geisteswissenschaften took the shape of idiographic descriptions, which focus on the particular, unique, and contingent. The natural sciences, on the other hand, are generalizing, law-positing, and nomothetic. Idiographic descriptions are intended to inform, nomothetic explanations to demonstrate. The idiographic deals in Gestaltungen, the nomothetic in Gesetze. Both are equally parts of the human endeavor.

The inclination to seek a more multifaceted conception of subjectivity was a hallmark of the Baden Neo-Kantians. The mind is not a purely mathematical or logical function designed to construct laws and apply them to the world of objects; it works in accordance with the environment in which it operates. What is constructed is done as a response to a need generated by that socio-cultural-historical background. This notion was a sort of leitmotif to Windelband’s own history of philosophy, which for the first time addressed philosophers organically in terms of the philosophical problems they faced and endeavored to solve rather than as either a straightforward chronology, a series of schools, or, certainly, a sort of Hegelian conception of a graduated dialectical unfolding of a single grand idea.

Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936) began his career with a concentration on epistemology. Alongside many Neo-Kantians, he denied the cogency of a thing itself, and thereby reduced an ontology of externalities to a study of the subjective contents of a common, universal mind. Having dissertated under Windelband in 1888 and succeeding him at Heidelberg in 1916, Rickert also came to reject the Marburger's assumption that the methodologies of natural science were the rules for thinking as such. Rickert argued instead that the mind engages the world along the dual lines of Geisteswissenschaften and Naturwissenschaften according to idiographic or nomothetic judgments respectively, the division which Rickert borrowed from his friend Windelband and elaborated upon (although it is sometimes attributed to Rickert or even Dilthey mistakenly). And similar to him as well, Rickert considered it a major project of philosophy to ground the former in a critical method, as a sort of transcendental science of culture. Where Rickert went his own way was in his critique of scientific explanations insofar as they rested on abstracted generalizations and in his privilege of historical descriptions on account of their attention to life’s genuine particularity and the often irrational character of historical change. Where Windelband saw equality-but-difference between the Geistes—and Naturwissenschaften, Rickert saw the latter as deficient insofar as it was incapable of addressing values.

History, for Rickert, was the exemplary case of a human science. Historians write about demonstrable facts in time and space, wherein the truth or falsity of a claim can be demonstrated with roughly the same precision as the natural sciences. The relational links between historical events – causes, influences, consequences – rely on mind-centered concepts rather than on observable features of a world outside the historian; though this of itself would not preclude the possibility of at least phenomenal explanations of history. More importantly, historians deal with events which cannot be isolated, repeated, or tested, particular individuals whose actions cannot be subsumed under generalizations, and with human values which resist positive nomothetic explanation. Those values constitute the essence of an historiographical account in a way entirely foreign to the physical sciences, whose objects of inquiry – atoms, gravitational forces, chemical bonds, etc.—remain value-neutral. A historian passes judgment about the successes and failures of policies, assigns titular appellations from Alexander the Great to Ivan the Terrible, decides who is king and who a tyrant, and regards eras as contributions or hindrances to human progress. The values of historians essentially comprise what story is told about the past, even if this sacrifices history’s status as an exact, demonstrable, or predictive science.

Rickert’s differentiation of the methods of history and science has been influential on post-modern continental theorists, in part through his friend and colleague, Karl Jaspers (1883-1969), and through his doctoral student, Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). The traditional scientific reliance on a correspondential theory of truth seemed woefully uncritical and thereby inadequate to the cultural sciences. The very form of reality should be understood as a product of a subject’s judgment. However, Rickert’s recognition of this subjective side did not entangle him in value relativism. Although the historian’s values, for example, do indeed inform the account, Rickert also thought that values were nothing exclusively personal. Values, in fact, express proximate universals across cultures and eras. Philosophy itself, as a critical inquiry into the values that inform judgment, reveals the endurance and trans-cultural nature of values in such a way that grounds the objectivity of an historical account in the objectivity of the values he or she holds. That truth is something that ‘ought to be sought’ is perhaps one such value. But Rickert has been criticized for believing that the values of historians on issues of personal ethics, the defensibility of wars, the treatment of women, or the social effects of religion were universally agreed upon.

4. Associated Members

Twentieth-century attempts to categorize thinkers historically into this or that school led to some debate about which figures were ‘really’ Neo-Kantian. But this overlooks the fact that even until the mid-1880’s the term ‘Neo-Kantian’ was rarely self-appellated. Unlike other more tightly-knit schools of thought, the nature of the Neo-Kantian movement allowed for a number of loosely-associated members, friends, and students, who were seekers of truth first and proponents of a doctrine second. Although each engaged the basic terminology and transcendental framework of either Kant or the Neo-Kantians, none did so wholesale or uncritically.

Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933) remains arguably the best scholar of Kant after Fischer and Cohen. And he probably maintained the closest ties with Neo-Kantianism without being assimilated into one or the other school. His massive commentary, begun in 1881 and left unfinished due to his health, exposited not only Kant’s work, but also the history of Neo-Kantian interpretation to that point. He founded the Kant-Studien in 1897, which is both the worldwide heart of Kant studies and the model for all author-based periodicals published in philosophy. Vaihinger’s own philosophy, which resonates in contemporary debates about fictionalism and anti-realism, takes as its starting point a curious blend of Kant, Lange, and Nietzsche in his Die Philosophie des Als-Ob (1911). For Vaihinger, the expressions that stem from our subjective makeup render moot the question whether they correspond to the real world. Not only do the concepts of math and logic have a subjective source, as per many of the Neo-Kantians, but the claims of religion, ethics, and even philosophy turn out to be subjectively-generated illusions that are found to be particularly satisfying to certain kinds of life, and thereafter propagated for the sake of more successfully navigating an unconceptualizable reality in-itself. Human psychology is structured to behave ‘as-if’ these concepts and mental projections corresponded to the way things really were, though in reality there is no way to prove whether they do. Freedom, a key notion for Vaihinger, is not merely one side of a misunderstanding between reason and the understanding, but a useful projection without which we could neither act nor live.

Wilhelm Dilthey (1833-1911) remains alongside Vaihinger as one of the great patrons of Kant scholarship for his work on the Academy Edition of Kant’s works, which began in 1900. Taught by both Fischer in Heidelberg and Trendelenburg in Berlin, Dilthey was strongly influenced by the hermeneutics of Schleiermacher as well, and entwines his Neo-Kantian denial of material realism with the hermeneutical impulse to see judgment as socio-culturally informed interpretation. Dilthey shares with the Baden school the distinction between nomothetic and idiographic sciences. Where he stresses the distinction, though, is slightly different. The natural sciences explain by way of causal relationships, whereas history makes understood by correctly associating particulars and wholes. In this way, the practice of history  itself allows us to better understand the Lebenzusammenhang –how all life’s aspects are interconnected—in a way the natural sciences, insofar as they treat the objects of their study as abstract generalizations, cannot. The natural sciences utilize an abstract Verstand; the cultural sciences use a more holistic way of understanding, a Verstehen.

Despite his shared interest in the conditions of experience, Dilthey is usually not considered a Neo-Kantian. Among several key differences, he rejects the Marburg proclivity to construct laws of thinking and experience that supposedly hold for all rational beings. Their consideration of the self as a set of logico-mathematical rules was an illegitimate abstraction from the really-lived, historically-contextualized human experience. In its place he stresses the ways historicity and social contexts shape the experiences and thinking processes of unique individuals. In distinction from the Baden school, Dilthey rejects Rickert’s theses about both the necessarily phenomenal and universal character of historical experience. Since we have unmediated access to our lived inner life through a sort of ‘reflexive awareness’, our explanations of historical events may indeed require a degree of generalization and abstraction; however, our sympathetic awareness of agent’s motivations and intentions remains direct. That inner world is not representational or inferential, but – contrary to the natural sciences – lived from within our inter-contextualized experience of the world. In this way, Dilthey alsocrossed the mainstay Neo-Kantian position on the role of psychology in the human sciences. It is not a field alongside sociology or economics that requires a transcendental grounding in order to gain a nomothetic status. Psychology is an immediate descriptive science that alone enables the other Geisteswissenschaften to be understood properly as a sort of mediation between the individual and their social milieu. Dilthey thought the results of psychology will, contra Windelband, allow us to move beyond a purely idiographic description of individuals to a law-like (though not strictly nomothetic) typology according to worldviews or ‘Weltanschauungen’.

Max Weber (1864-1920) was a student and friend of Rickert’s in Freiburg, and was also concerned with distinguishing the logic of historical judgment from that of the natural sciences. The past itself contains no intelligibility. Intelligibility is something added by means of the historian’s act of contextualizing an individual in his or her social environment. Unlike Comte (1798-1857), whatever ‘laws’ we might discover in history are really just constructions. And unlike Durkheim (1858-1917), talk of ‘societies’ runs the risk of hypostasizing what is actually a convenient symbol. Social history should instead be about trying to understand the motivations behind individual and particular changes.

The sociology of Georg Simmel (1858-1918) was also informed by a personal connection to Rickert. From its foundation by Comte and Mill (1806-1873), sociology had been marked by both a positivist theory of explanation-under-law and by an uncritical empiricism. Simmel, with the familiar Neo-Kantian move, undermined their naivety and replaced it with a more careful consideration of how society could be conceived at all. How do individuals relate to society, in what sense does society have a sort of psychology in its own right that generates changes and out of which spiritual shifts emerge, and how do the representational faculties affect societal rituals like money, fashion, and the construction of cities?

Taking history away from its sociological orientation and back to its conceptual roots was Emil Lask (1875-1915). Having dissertated on Fichte under Rickert in 1902 and habilitated on legal theory under Windelband in 1905, Lask was called to Heidelberg in 1910, where his inaugural lecture –“Hegel in seinem Verhältnis zur Weltanschauung der Aufklärung”— intimated a rather different line of influence. His work is comprised of two major published titles: Logik der Philosophie oder die Kategorienlehre (1911) and Lehre vom Urteil (1912). In them, Lask works out an immediate-intuitional theory of knowledge that went beyond the Kantian categories of the understanding of objects into the realm of a logic of values, and even probed the borders of the irrational. In fact he criticized the generalities of the Baden school’s Problemsgeschichte for lacking a concrete grounding in actual historical movements. Although Lask’s insistence to fight on the eastern front in the First World War cut short what should have been a promising career, he had significant influence on German philosophy through Weber, Lukács, and Heidegger. His death, in the same year as Windelband’s, stands as the usual endpoint of the Baden school of Neo-Kantianism.

The physiognomic leanings of the Neo-Kantian forerunners, like Helmholtz and Lange, were revitalized by a pair of philosophers of considerable scientific reputation. Richard Avenarius (1843-96) and Ernst Mach (1838-1916), founders of empirio-criticism, sought to overcome the idealism-materialism rift in German academic philosophy by closer investigation into the nature of experience. This entailed replacing traditional physics with a phenomenalistic conception of thermodynamics as the model of positivist science. In his Kritik der reinen Erfahrung (1888-90), Avenarius showed that the physiognomic factors of experience vary according to environmental conditions. As the nervous system develops regular patterns within a relatively constant environment, experience itself becomes regularized. That feeling of being accustomed to typical experiences, rather than logical deduction, is what counts as knowledge. Mach was similarly critical of realist assumptions about sensation and experience, positing instead the mind’s inherent ability to economize the welter of experience into abbreviated forms. Although the concepts we use, especially those in the natural sciences, are indispensable for communication and for navigating the world, they cannot demonstrate the substantial objects from which they are believed to be derived.

Alois Riehl (1844-1924) denied Liebmann’s claim that the Kantian thing-in-itself was nothing more than an incidental remnant of enlightenment rationalism. Were it, Riehl argued, Kantianism should give up any pretension to a positive engagement with science. Kant in fact never entirely rejected the possibility of apprehending the thing-in-itself, only the attempt to do so by way of the understanding and reason. It was not inconsistent with Kant to try to articulate noumena mediately, via indirect inferences from their perceptible characteristics in observation. Beyond its spatio-temporal and categorical qualifications, the particular characteristics of an object which we perceive and by which we distinguish it from any other object depend not on us so much, as upon its mode of appearance as it really is outside us.

Although Rudolph Otto (1869-1937) taught in Marburg, he had little interest in the logic of mathematics per se. Otto did, however, follow his school’s inclination to understand the objects of study in terms of the transcendental conditions of their experience as fundamental to the proper study, specifically of religion. What Otto discovered thereby was a new kind of experience –the ‘holy’— that was irreducible either to the categories of the understanding or to feeling. This had a substantial influence on the religious phenomenology of two other loosely-associated Neo-Kantian thinkers, Ernst Troeltsch (1865-1923) and Paul Tillich (1886-1965).

With certain Hegelian overtones, Bruno Bauch (1877-1942) was another fringe member of the Baden school with much to say about religion. While he studied with Fischer in Heidelberg, Rickert in Freiburg, and wrote his Habilitationschrift under Vaihinger in Berlin, he was more concerned than most Badeners with logic and mathematics, and in this respect represents a key link between the Neo-Kantians and both Frege, his confidant, and Carnap, his student. But his views about religion and contemporary politics kept Bauch at considerable distance from mainline Neo-Kantians. Due, in fact to his overt anti-Semitism, he was made to resign his editorship at the Kant-Studien. Having argued that Jews were intrinsically foreign to German culture, his embrace of Nazism during the very period of Cassirer’s emigration was an obvious affront, too, to the legacy of Cohen, whatever honors it may have gained him by the state-run academies.

Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950) began his career as a Neo-Kantian under Cohen and Natorp, but soon after developed his own form of realism. While remaining largely beholden to transcendental semantics, Hartmann rejected the basic Neo-Kantian position on the priority of epistemology to ontology. The first condition for thinking about objects is itself the existence of those objects. It was an error of idealism to assume the human mind constitutes the knowability of those objects and equally the error of materialism to assume that those objects are all open to knowability. To Hartmann, some objects were able to be known by way of their appropriate categorization. Others, however, must remain mysterious, closed off to human inquiry at least until philosophy could point the way toward new methods of comprehending them. Philosophy’s task, accordingly, was to discover the discontinuities between the ‘subjective categories’ of thought and the ‘objective categories’ of reality, and, where possible, to eventually overcome them.

Given the predominance of Neo-Kantianism in German academies during the turn of the century, a number of fringe-members deserve at least mention here. None can be considered an orthodox 'Marburg' or 'Southwestern' school Neo-Kantian, but each had certain affinities or at least critical engagements with the general movement. Friedrich Paulsen (1846-1908), Johannes Volkelt (1848-1930), Benno Erdmann (1851-1921), Rudolf Stammler (1856-1938), Karl Vorländer (1860-1928), the Harvard psychologist Hugo Münsterberg (1863-1916), Ernst Troeltsch (1865-1923), the plant physiologist Jonas Cohn (1869-1947), Albert Görland (1869-1952), Richard Hönigswald (1875-1947), Artur Buchenau (1879-1946), Eduard Spranger (1882-1963), and the neo-Friesian Leonard Nelson (1882-1927), who, though more critical than not about Neo-Kantian epistemology, shared certain ethical and social Neo-Kantian themes. There was also significant Neo-Kantian influence on French universities in the same years, with representative figures like Charles Renouview (1815-1903), Jules Lachelier (1832-1918), Émile Boutroux (1845-1921), Octave Hamelin (1856-1907), and Léon Brunschvicg (1869-1944). (For a more detailed look at French Neo-Kantians, see Luft and Capeillères 2010, pp. 70-80.)

5. Legacy

From March 17 to April 6, 1929, the city of Davos, Switzerland hosted an International University Course intended to bring together the continent’s best philosophers. The keynote lecturers and subsequent leaders of the famous disputation were the author of the recent Being and Time, Martin Heidegger, and the author of the recent Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, Ernst Cassirer. Heidegger’s contribution was his interpretation of Kant as chiefly concerned with trying to ground metaphysical speculation in what he calls the transcendental imagination through temporally-finite human reason. Cassirer countered by revealing Heidegger’s formulation of that imagination as unwarrantedly accepting of the non-rational. Agreeing that the progress of Kantian philosophy must acknowledge the finitude of human life, as Heidegger held, Cassirer emphasized that beyond this it must retain the spirit of critical inquiry, the openness to natural science, and the clarity of rational argumentation that marked Kant himself as a great philosopher and not only as an intuitive visionary. The Analytic philosopher Rudolf Carnap (1891-1970) was a participant in the Davos congress, and was thereafter prompted to write a highly critical review of Heidegger. What should have been an event that revitalized Neo-Kantianism in contemporary thought became instead the symbol both for the rise of the Analytic school of philosophy and for its cleavage from Continental thought. Increasingly, Cassirer was viewed as defending an unfashionable way of philosophizing, and after he emigrated from Germany in the wake of increasing anti-Jewish sentiment in 1933 the influence of Neo-Kantianism waned.

Even while serious Kant scholarship thrives in the Anglophone world of the early 21st century, Neo-Kantianism remains perhaps the single worst-neglected region of the historical study of ideas. This is unfortunate for Kant studies, since it inculcates an attitude of offhandedness toward nearly a century of superb scholarship on Kant, from Fischer to Cohen to Vaihinger to Cassirer. The Neo-Kantians were also the single most dominant group in German philosophy departments for half a century. Few works of Cohen, Natorp, Rickert, or Windelband have been translated in their entirety, to say nothing of the less prominent figures. Cassirer and Dilthey have attracted the interest of solid scholars, though it tends to be historical and hermeneutical rather than programmatic. Study of Simmel and Weber has been consistently strong, but more for their sociological conclusions than their philosophical starting points. To the rest, it has become customary to attribute a secondary philosophy rank behind the Idealists, Marxists, and Positivists –and even a tertiary one behind the Romantics, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, and Kierkegaard, none of whom, it may be reminded, held a professorship in the field. It is not uncommon even in lengthy histories of 19th Century philosophy to find their names omitted entirely.

The reasons for this neglect are complex and not entirely clear. The writing of the Marburg school is dense and academically forbidding, true, but that of Windelband, Cassirer, Vaihinger, and Simmel are quite eloquent. The personalities of Cohen and Rickert were eccentric to the point of unattractive, though Natorp and Cassirer were congenial. Their ad hominem criticisms of rival members seem crass, but such gossip is undeniably salacious as well. Some of their writing was intentionally set against the backdrop of obscure political developments, though often with other figures such obscurities give rise to cottage-industries of historical scholarship (see Willey, 1978). The two World Wars no doubt had a severely negative impact on the continuity of any movement or school, though phenomenology has fared far better. The fact that many of the Neo-Kantians were both social-liberals and Jewish virtually guaranteed their works would be repressed in Hitler’s Germany. Forced resignation and even exile was a reality for many Jewish academics; Cassirer even had his habilitation at Straßburg rejected explicitly on the grounds that he was Jewish. He and Brunschvicg both escaped likely persecution by giving up their homeland. But as the examples of Bauch and Fischer make clear, Neo-Kantianism need not be subsumed under a specifically Jewish or even minimally Semitically-tolerant worldview. And as Cohen’s resurgent legacy in Jewish scholarship proves, not all aspects that were once repressed need forever be.

To ignore the Neo-Kantians, however, creates the false impression of a philosophical black hole in the German academies between the decline of Hegelianism and the rise of phenomenology, a space more often devoted to anti-academic philosophers like Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Moreover, the Neo-Kantian influence on 20th century minds from Husserl and Heidegger to Frege and Carnap is pronounced, and should not be brushed aside lightly. In terms of early 21st century philosophy, Neo-Kantianism reminds us of the importance of reflecting on method and of philosophizing in conjunction with the best contemporary research in the natural sciences, something for which Helmholtz, Lange, and Cassirer stand as exemplars. And just as Liebmann’s motto ‘Back to Kant’ was exhorted to bridge the gap between idealism and materialism in the 19th century, so too may it be a sort of third way that rectifies the split between contemporary continental and analytic partisanship. If the old saying still carries water, then “one can philosophize with Kant, or against Kant; but one cannot philosophize without Kant.”

Fortunately there are signs of renewed interest. In 2010, Luft and Rudolf Makkreel edited Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press), which presents a well-rounded contemporary collection of research papers. In Continental Europe, no one has done more to revitalize Neo-Kantian studies than Helmut Holzhey and Fabien Capeillères, who have each published a row of books, editions, and papers on the theme. Under the directorship of Christian Krijnen and Kurt Walter Zeidler, the Desiderata der Neukantianismus-Forschung has hosted a number of congresses and meetings throughout Europe. A 2008 issue of the Philosophical Forum was dedicated to Neo-Kantianism generally, and featured articles by Rolf-Peter Horstmann, Paul Guyer, Michael Friedman, and Frederick Beiser among others. Studies of particular Neo-Kantians have been produced by Poma (1997), Krijnen (2001), Zijderveld (2006), Skildelsky (2008), and Munk (2010). And Charles Bambach (1995), Michael Friedmann (2000), Tom Rockmore (2000), and Peter Eli Gordon (2012) have composed fine works of intellectual history concerning the heritage of Neo-Kantianism in the twentieth century. 

6. References and Further Reading

a. Principle Works by Neo-Kantians and Associated Members

  • Helmholtz
  • Über die Erhaltung der Kraft (Berlin: G. Reimer, 1847).
  • Über das Sehen des Menschen (Leipzig: Leopold Voss, 1855).
  • Lange
  • Die Arbeiterfrage in ihrer Bedeutung für Gegenwart und Zukunft (Duisburg: W. Falk & Volmer, 1865).
  • Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1866).
  • Logische Studien: Ein Beitrag zur Neubegründung der formalen Logik und der Erkenntnisstheorie (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1877).
  • Cohen
  • “Zur Controverse zwischen Trendelenburg und Kuno Fischer,” Zeitschrift für Völkerpsychologie and Sprachewissenschaft 7 (1871): 249–296.
  • Kants Theorie der Erfahrung (Berlin: Dümmler, 1885 [1871]).
  • Die systematische Begriffe in Kants vorkritische Schriften nach ihrem Verhältniss zum kritischen Idealismus (Berlin: Dümmler, 1873).
  • “Friedrich Albert Lange,” Preußische Jahrbücher 37 [4] (1876): 353-381.
  • Kants Begründung der Ethik (Berlin: Dümmler, 1877).
  • Kants Begründung der Aesthetik (Berlin: Dümmler, 1889).
  • Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums (Leipzig: Fock, 1919).
  • Natorp
  • Forschungen zur Geschichte des Erkenntnisproblems im Altertum: Protagoras, Demokrit, Epikur und die Skepsis (Berlin: Darmstadt, 1884).
  • Platos Ideenlehre: Eine Einführung in den Idealismus (Leipzig: Dürr, 1903).
  • Philosophische Propädeutik (Marburg: Elwert, 1903).
  • Die logischen Grundlagen der exakten Wissenschaften (Leipzig: Teubner, 1910).
  • “Kant und die Marburger Schule,” Kant-Studien 17 (1912): 193-221.
  • Sozialidealismus: Neue Richtlinien sozialer Erziehung (Berlin: Julius Springer, 1920).
  • Cassirer
  • Zur Einsteinschen Relativitätstheorie: Erkenntnistheoretische Betrachtungen (Berlin: Bruno Cassirer, 1921).
  • Philosophie der symbolischen Formen, 3 vols. (Berlin: Bruno Cassirer, 1923-9).
  • Sprache und Mythos: Ein Beitrag zum Problem der Götternamen (Leipzig: Teubner, 1925).
  • Individuum und Kosmos in der Philosophie der Renaissance (Leipzig: Teubner, 1927).
  • Die Idee der republikanischen Verfassung (Hamburg: Friedrichsen, 1929).
  • An Essay on Man (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1944).
  • The Myth of the State (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1946).

  • Windelband
  • Die Geschichte der neueren Philosophie in ihrem Zusammenhange mit der allgemeinen Cultur und den besonderen Wissenschaften dargestellt, 2 vols. (Leipzig: Breitkopf & Härtel, 1878–80).
  • Praeludien: Aufsaetze und Reden zur Philosophie und ihrer Geschichte (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1884).
  • Einleitung in die Philosophie: Grundriß der philosophischen Wissenschaften, edited by Fritz Medicus (Tübingen: Mohr, 1914).
  • Rickert
  • Der Gegenstand der Erkenntnis: ein Beitrag zum Problem der philosophischen Transcendenz (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1892).
  • Die Grenzen der naturwissenschaftlichen Begriffsbildung, 2 vols. (Tübingen: Mohr, 1896-1902).
  • Kulturwissenschaft und Naturwissenschaft (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1899).
  • Die Heidelberger Tradition und Kants Kritizismus, 2 vols. (Berlin: Junker und Dünnhaupt, 1934).
  • Dilthey
  • Gesammelte Schriften, 26 vols. (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1914–2006).
  • Vaihinger
  • Hartman, Dühring und Lange: Zur Geschichte der deutschen Philosophie im XIX. Jahrhundert (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1876).
  • Kommentar zu Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft, 2 vols. (Stuttgart: Spemann & Union Deutsche Verlagsgesellschaft, 1881-92).
  • Die Philosophie des Als Ob (Berlin: Reuther und Reichard, 1911).
  • Weber
  • Gesammelte Aufsätze zur Soziologie und Sozialpolitik (Tübingen: Mohr, 1924).
  • Simmel
  • Über sociale Differenzierung (Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot, 1890).
  • Die Probleme der Geschichtphilosophie (Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot, 1892).
  • Grundfragen der Soziologie (Berlin: Göschen, 1917).

  • Mach
  • Die Analyse der Empfindungen und das Verhältnis des Physischen zum Psychischen (Jena: Gustav Fischer, 1886).
  • Bauch
  • Studien zur Philosophie der exakten Wissenschaften (Heidelberg: C. Winter, 1911).
  • Wahrheit, Wert und Wirklichkeit (Leipzig: F. Meiner, 1923).
  • Lask
  • Gesammelte Schriften, 3 vols., edited by Eugen Herrigel (Tübingen: Mohr, 1923-24).
  • Hartmann
  • Zur Grundlegung der Ontologie (Berlin: Walter De Gruyter, 1935).

b. Secondary Literature

  • Bambach, Charles R., Heidegger, Dilthey and the Crisis of Historicism (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995).
  • Beiser, Frederick C., The German Historicist Tradition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011).
  • Ermarth, M., Wilhelm Dilthey: The Critique of Historical Reason (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1978).
  • Friedman, Michael, A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, Heidegger (Chicago: Open Court, 2000). Dynamics of Reason: The 1999 Kant Lectures at Stanford University (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2001).
  • Glatz, Uwe B., Emil Lask (Würzburg: Königshausen und Neumann, 2001).
  • Gordon, Peter E., Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2012).
  • Hartmann, E. v., Neukantianismus, Schopenhauerianismus und Hegelianismus in ihrer Stellung zu den philosophischen Aufgaben der Gegenwart (Berlin: C. Duncker, 2nd expanded edition 1877).
  • Heidegger, Martin, “Davoser Disputation zwischen Ernst Cassirer und Martin Heidegger,” in his, Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik (Frankfurt a.M.: Vittorio Klosertmann, 4th expanded edition 1973), 246-68.
  • Holzhey, Helmut, Cohen und Natorp, 2 vols. (Basel/Stuttgart: Schwabe & Co., 1986).  Historical Dictionary of Kant and Kantianism (Lanham, MD: Scarecrow Press, 2005).
  • Köhnke, K. C., Entstehung und Aufstieg des Neukantianismus: Die deutsche Universitätsphilosophie zwischen Idealismus und Positivismus (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1986).
  • Krijnen, Christian, Nachmetaphysischer Sinn: Eine problemgeschichtliche und systematische Studie zu den Prinzipien der Wertphilosophie Heinrich Rickerts (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2001).
  • Krijnen, Christian & Heinz, Marion (eds.), Kant im Neukantianismus (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2007).
  • Külpe, Oswald, The Philosophy of the Present in Germany (New York: Macmillan, 1913).
  • Luft, Sebastian & Capeillères, Fabien, “Neo-Kantianism in Germany and France,” in The History of Continental Philosophy Volume 3: The New Century, edited by Keith Ansell-Pearson & Alan D. Schrift (Durham: Acumen, 2010), 47-85.
  • Makkreel, Rudolph, Dilthey: Philosopher of the Human Studies (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1993).
  • Makkreel, Rudolph & Luft, Sebastian (eds.), Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 2010).
  • Munk, Reinier (ed.), Hermann Cohen’s Criticial Idealism (Dordrecht: Springer, 2010).
  • Ollig, Hans-Ludwig, Der Neukantianismus (Stuttgart: Metzler, 1979). Materialien zur Neukantianismus-Diskussion (Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1987).
  • Poma, Andrea, The Critical Philosophy of Hermann Cohen (Albany: SUNY Press, 1997).
  • Rockmore, Tom (ed.), Heidegger, German Idealism & Neo-Kantianism (Amherst, NY: Humanity Books, 2000).
  • Schnädelbach, Herbert, Philosophy in Germany, 1831–1933 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984).
  • Sieg, Ulrich, Aufstieg und Niedergang des Marburger Neukantianismus: Die Geschichte einer philosophischen Schulgemeinschaft (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1994).
  • Skidelsky, Edward, Ernst Cassirer: The Last Philosopher of Culture (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2008).
  • Willey, Thomas E., Back to Kant: The Revival of Kantianism in German Social and Historical Thought, 1860-1914 (Detroit: Wayne State University Press, 1978).
  • Zijderveld, Anton C., Rickert's Relevance: The Ontological Nature and Epistemological Functions of Values (Leiden: Brill, 2006).


Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
Providence College
U. S. A.

Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900—2002)

GadamerHans-Georg Gadamer was a leading Continental philosopher of the twentieth century. His importance lies in his development of hermeneutic philosophy. Hermeneutics, “the art of interpretation,” originated in biblical and legal fields and was later extended to all texts. Martin Heidegger, Gadamer’s teacher, completed the universalizing of the scope of hermeneutics by extending it beyond texts to all forms of human understanding. Hence philosophical hermeneutics inquires into the meaning and significance of understanding for human existence in general.

Gadamer was influenced by Heidegger’s interest in the “question of Being,” which aimed to draw our attention to the ubiquitous and ineffable nature of Being that underlies human existence. “Being” refers to something like a “ground” (although not in the modern sense of “foundation”) or, better, background, that precedes, conditions, and makes possible the particular forms of human knowing as found in science and the social sciences. Gadamer developed Heidegger’s commitment to the ubiquitous and fundamental nature of Being in three related ways.

First, Gadamer wanted to elucidate the historical and linguistic situatedness of human knowing and to emphasize the necessity and productivity of tradition and language for human thought. For example, when Gadamer wrote that “Being that could be understood is language,” he meant that Being underlies, exceeds, and makes possible language.

Second, Gadamer sought to contend against the hubris of twentieth century positivism by demonstrating that truth is not reducible to a set of criteria, as is suggested by promoters of there being a scientific method. Just as Heidegger set out to uncover the way in which Being makes beings possible, so Gadamer aimed to demonstrate that truths derivable from method require a deeper, more extensive Truth. In order to extend truth’s domain beyond that of method (and note that Gadamer was never against method or science—only their totalizing tendencies), Gadamer explicates truth as an event. Truth is not, fundamentally, what can be affirmed relative to a set of criteria but an event or experience in which we find ourselves engaged and changed. These first two points form the emphasis of his magnum opus, Truth and Method (Wahrheit und Methode).

A third way of understanding Gadamer’s defense of the ubiquity of Being can be seen in the practical trajectory of Gadamer’s hermeneutics that arises from his interest in Plato and Aristotle. From Plato, Gadamer discerns the centrality of dialogue as the means by which we come to understanding. Dialogue is rooted in and committed to furthering our common bond with one another to the extent that it affirms the finite nature of our human knowing and invites us to remain open to one another. It is our openness to dialogue with others that Gadamer sees as the basis for a deeper solidarity. With Aristotle, Gadamer affirms the commitment that all philosophy starts from praxis (human practice) and that hermeneutics is essentially practical philosophy. We must not allow knowing to remain only on the conceptual (that is, distanced and theoretical) level; we must remember that knowing emerges from our practical quest for meaning and significance. Gadamer’s hermeneutics elucidates how Being makes human existence meaningful, where Being refers to commonality we all share.

Gadamer’s many essays and talks on ethics, art, poetry, science, medicine, and friendship, as well as references to his work by thinkers in these fields, attest to the ubiquity and practical relevance of hermeneutic thought today.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Early Years: Platonic Urges
    2. Middle Years: Under the Influence of Heidegger
    3. Later Years: Truth and Method and Beyond.
  2. Hermeneutic Inceptions
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
  3. “Foundations” of Philosophical Hermeneutics: Truth and Method
    1. Truth Beyond Science
    2. Prejudice, Tradition, Authority, Horizon
    3. Dialectic, Dialogue, Language
  4. Critical Encounters
    1. E.D. Hirsch
    2. Jürgen Habermas
    3. Jacques Derrida
  5. Practical Philosophy: Hermeneutics Beyond Gadamer
    1. Hermeneutics as Dialogue: Ethical and Political Interventions
    2. Twentieth Century Anglo-American Appropriations
    3. Applied Hermeneutics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Collected Works in German
    2. Main Books by Gadamer in English
    3. Selected Secondary Literature

1. Biography

a. Early Years: Platonic Urges

Hans-Georg Gadamer was born on February 11, 1900 in Marburg, Germany. Two years later his family moved to Breslau where his father took up the position of professor of pharmacological chemistry. The presence of his domineering, strict Prussian father devoted to natural science, and the absence of his deeply pietistic mother (who died in 1904 from diabetes) perhaps contributed to Gadamer’s interest in poetry and the arts. In his words, poetry and the arts were the closest things an “unredeemed agnostic” had to contend with the limits of human knowing (Gadamer: A Biography, 20-23).

In 1918 Gadamer began his studies at Breslau and then moved to the University of Marburg, where his father received a teaching position and later became rector. At Marburg, Gadamer first studied with Richard Hönigswald, who introduced him to neo-Kantianism, and then with Nicolai Hartmann, whose brand of phenomenology presented challenges to the neo-Kantianism of Hönigswald. Hartmann’s critique of neo-Kantianism proved a crucial impetus for Gadamer’s own thinking, including his subsequent turn away from neo-Kantianism. Yet Gadamer eventually came to question Hartmann’s rigid epistemology due to the fact that it remained committed both to Aristotelian realism and to an impoverished form of phenomenology, which failed to take seriously the importance of the knower’s perspective. Gadamer accused Hartmann’s phenomenology of not being radical enough since it ignored the more fundamental conditions of human knowing.

In 1922 Gadamer wrote his (unpublished) thesis with Paul Natorp on “The Nature of Pleasure according to Plato’s dialogues” (despite Natorp’s initial suggestion to write on Fichte). Natorp, himself a prominent Plato scholar and neo-Kantian at the time, took over in the wake of the declining influence of the neo-Kantians at Marburg. In Gadamer’s thesis we find the seeds of his later writings on Plato and Aristotle, gleaned from Natorp, that emphasized the unity of the one and the many, the forms, and the realm of sensuality. Gadamer was not only influenced by the mysticism of Natorp but also by the esotericism of the poet Stefan George, of whose circle he was a member. While a definitive causality is impossible to prove, one can detect connections between the recurrent challenge to scientism that pervades Gadamer's later, explicitly hermeneutic philosophy and the various “mysticisms” of Plato, Natorp, George, and Heidegger. What can be defended, however, is that what united the “mysticisms” of these thinkers, and thus inspired Gadamer, was their gesturing towards the realm beyond being that exposes the limitations of human understanding. While some used their “mysticism” to avoid the prosaic cares of daily life—cares that only blocked our access to this loftier, more radical and thus worthier realm—Gadamer rejected such an escapism and instead extolled “mysticism” for its propensity to insist on the finitude of human existence. True to his own unique interpretation of Plato that sought to refuse simplistic dualisms, Gadamer advocated acknowledging the beyond while at the same time insisting on our practical existence. In other words, human thinking always requires an acknowledgment of what cannot be fully captured in language, yet at the same time language, as that part of Being that can be understood, functions to create our human world and funds meaning. These themes of the productivity of the liminal or “horizonal”(for example, as developed by his notion “fusion of horizons”), and language’s in-between status, were born out of his early “Platonism” and served to undergird his later hermeneutic philosophy.

b. Middle Years: Under the Influence of Heidegger

Gadamer first encountered the written work of Heidegger in 1921 after reading one of Heidegger’s papers on Aristotle. Heidegger’s Aristotelian phenomenology, which refused the reductionism of Husserl’s phenomenology, provided Gadamer with the tools and impetus to deal the final blow to his earlier tendencies toward neo-Kantianism. During the summer of 1923 he pursued studies with Heidegger in Freiburg, where he also attended classes of Edmund Husserl, who although Heidegger’s teacher, stood in his shadow. When Heidegger was offered a position as chair at Marburg in October 1923, Gadamer followed him, a move that exacerbated the tension between Heidegger and Hartmann since many of Hartmann’s students ended up leaving him to study with Heidegger. Fellow students at Marburg during that period included Hannah Arendt, Hans Jonas, Jakob Klein, Karl Löwith, and Leo Strauss. Gadamer’s work with Heidegger was initially delayed due to Gadamer’s contraction of polio in 1922, which later served to exclude him from military service. It was during Gadamer’s convalescence that Hartmann worked to arrange a marriage for Gadamer to Frida Katz in 1923, with whom he had a daughter, Jutta, in 1926.

It should be noted that Gadamer’s relationship with Heidegger was an ambivalent one. Early on, Gadamer had thought he would write his Habilitation (doctoral dissertation) with Hartmann, but then he set his sights on Heidegger. However, Heidegger was initially unimpressed by Gadamer’s philosophical potential and encouraged him to pursue philology instead. Gadamer followed his advice and spent a number of years studying Plato with Paul Friedländer, from whom he learned about Plato’s dialogic and dialectic philosophy, an emphasis that would prove central to Gadamer’s later hermeneutics. In 1928, upon hearing of Gadamer’s plan to write his Habilitation with Friedländer, Heidegger reversed his earlier view of Gadamer’s incompetence as a philosopher and wrote a letter inviting Gadamer to work with him. In 1929 Gadamer took up a teaching position at Marburg and completed his Habilitation with Heidegger, published in 1931 as Plato’s Dialectical Ethics.

In 1933, while teaching courses on ethics and aesthetics at Marburg, Gadamer signed a declaration in support of Hitler and his National Socialist regime. Did this mean that like his teacher, Heidegger, he was an unabashed supporter of National Socialism? If so, as some suggest (Orozco), why would Gadamer have expressed shock months earlier when Heidegger had announced his own support for National Socialism? And why did Gadamer intentionally cultivate and maintain friendships with Jews during those years, while distancing himself from Heidegger until after the war? Gadamer’s biographer, Jean Grondin, offers details of Gadamer’s actions and inactions during this vexed period, and concludes that while Gadamer may have lacked the political savvy and courage for resistance, he was, unlike Heidegger, no Nazi. Reflecting back in later years Gadamer describes his shortsightedness: “it was a widespread conviction in intellectual circles that Hitler in coming to power would deconstruct the nonsense he had used to drum up the movement, and we counted the anti-Semitism as part of this nonsense. We were to learn differently” (Gadamer: A Biography, 75).

c. Later Years: Truth and Method and Beyond.

In 1939 Gadamer became a professor at Leipzig, where his first course was “Art and History,” which, as Grondin maintains, paved the way for his magnum opus, Truth and Method, published in 1960. In the same year, his first festschrift, which includes an essay by Heidegger, was also published. At Leipzig, Gadamer served as dean of the Philology and History Department and the Philosophy Faculty, as well as director of the Psychology Institute and in 1946 became rector. Unhappy due to political criticism launched at him, he sought a position in the west and initially taught at Frankfurt (1948) before accepting Karl Jasper’s offer to chair the philosophy department at Heidelberg (1949), where he taught until his official “retirement” in 1968. In 1950 he married again, this time to his former student and member of the resistance, Käte Lekebusch, with whom he had a daughter, Andrea, in 1956.

It was not until after his retirement that he gained status as an international thinker and a philosopher in his own right. This influence was due to several reasons. First, important debates with Jürgen Habermas and Jacques Derrida served to distinguish philosophical hermeneutics as a serious contender against both the critique of ideology and deconstruction. Second, he spent nearly twenty years teaching and lecturing in the United States each fall semester. Finally, Truth and Method was published in English in 1975. He continued to teach and lecture internationally and in Germany into his one-hundredth year. Gadamer died on March 13, 2002 in Heidelberg, while recovering from heart surgery. Today he is recognized as the preeminent voice for philosophical hermeneutics. Four claims focus the significance and originality of his hermeneutics: 1) hermeneutic philosophy is fundamentally practical philosophy, 2) truth is not reducible to scientific method, 3) all knowing is historically situated, and 4) all understanding reflects the ubiquity of language.

2. Hermeneutic Inceptions

a. Plato

Gadamer acknowledged that Plato, far more than Hegel or any other German thinker, motivated and inspired all his hermeneutics. Gadamer, though, remains no “traditional” Platonist, for, his early work on the Ancient Greeks is devoted to an attentive and nuanced re-reading of the significance of Plato for us today. What distinguishes Gadamer’s work on Plato is his desire to understand the questions and problems that motivated Plato. This approach stands opposed to attempts, common in Ancient Greek scholarship of the early twentieth century (for example, Leo Strauss and his followers), to uncover the “hidden doctrine” of Plato. In attempting to answer why Plato wrote his dialogues and what he was arguing against, Gadamer incites us not just to put questions to Plato—which can lead to an excessively distanced criticism of Plato—but to allow Plato to question us. The radical return to Plato made Gadamer all the more receptive to and excited by the thinking of Heidegger who also sought to understand Aristotle anew and in a more radical way.

As a result of his unique approach, Gadamer’s interpretation of Plato avoids the standard dualism (entrenched in part, Gadamer tells us, by Aristotle’s literalist readings of his teacher) that pits the Good-Beyond-Being against the good-for-us. Gadamer emphasizes the productive, rather than problematic, nature of the chorismos (the separation) between the sensual world of appearances and the transcendent realm of the forms. In other words, pace Aristotle, this separation was necessary and productive and not something to be overcome. Gadamer follows Plato in insisting on the ontological nature of the Good. Far from an empty concept, as Aristotle charged, the Good serves as an assumption that makes possible all understanding. The Good symbolizes the way in which thinking always “points beyond itself” (Philosophical Apprenticeships, 186). The plethora and variety of appearances must be made sense of in light of the assumption that something lies beyond our present understanding—namely, the Idea of the Good. Plato appealed to the Good in order to criticize the ethical relativism of the Eleatics. Gadamer draws our attention to how Plato’s appeal to the Good allowed him to transform Eleatic dialectic in two important ways: 1) to direct it towards getting clear about the “subject matter” (die Sache) as opposed to having as its goal the defeat of one’s opponent with logical prowess, and 2) to ground it in Socratic dialogue. Gadamer himself sought to recover the emphasis on the early Platonic dialectic, while refusing its later Hegelian instantiation, in order to return philosophy to Plato’s original intention as a dialectic defined primarily as the “art of carrying on a conversation” (Philosophical Apprenticeships, 186). The key to Gadamer’s later hermeneutics is grasping the significance of how Gadamer understands the connection between Platonic dialectic and Socratic dialogue.

b. Aristotle

Gadamer also returns anew to Aristotle. By stressing the import of Aristotle’s practical philosophy as that which emphasizes the background, that is, the conditions, for knowing, Gadamer challenged one of the leading Aristotelians of his day, Werner Jaeger. All knowing always starts from practical human concerns and must not lose its way in abstraction (a charge Gadamer later made against the Critique of Ideology). Gadamer’s interest in practical philosophy and its basis in human experience motivated hermeneutics’ ethical sensibilities, for instance, as witnessed in Gadamer’s esteem of phronesis as a key hermeneutic principle. What Gadamer wants to draw out from phronesis is the way in which knowledge is for the sake of acting, in other words, for the sake of living. An excessively theoretical or scientific knowledge forgets that knowledge stems out of and must return to praxis. But what sort of knowledge is sufficient for action conditioned by the variability of human life? The knowledge appropriate for the task is what Aristotle names as “phronesis.” Such a knowledge requires application but not in the way that modern science understands application: namely, the secondary and discrete step that follows from a prior theoretical knowledge. Neither is it adequately expressed by “judgment” (as in its later Kantian instanciation that subsumes a particular under a universal.) that subsumes a particular under a universal. Phronesis rejects the theory-practice dualism of both of these models of knowledge and instead entails the ability to transform a prior communal knowledge, that is, sensus communis, into a know-how relevant for a new situation. It is this requirement for human judgment emerging forth from a specific human community that Gadamer describes as reflective of hermeneutic understanding. The ethical overtone of phronesis as a hermeneutic concept suggests the way in which this knowledge is directed toward right action based on a “universal” (that is, communal rather than transcendent) knowledge. As Gadamer explains in Truth and Method, while “hermeneutical consciousness is involved neither with technical nor moral knowledge” (315) there is an overlap with the latter to the extent to which it entails right action based primarily on the ability to make one’s own that which comes to one out of a community. Such knowledge emerges out from and returns to praxis. Accordingly, one of Gadamer’s key contributions to philosophy, and one that took him beyond his teacher, Heidegger, was to insist that hermeneutics is practical philosophy. Gadamer clarifies that practical philosophy is rooted in human existence, which is never solipsistic but always communal. Rejecting the absolutism of modernity, Gadamer’s philosophy emphasized experience, but not the isolated existence of much 19th and 20th century existentialism. Rather, for Gadamer, existence means existing with others, which requires dialogue born of humility and an openness for inquiry: “hermeneutic philosophy understands itself not as an absolute position but as a way of experience. It insists that there is no higher principle than holding oneself open in a conversation” (Philosophical Hermeneutics, 189).

3. “Foundations” of Philosophical Hermeneutics: Truth and Method

a. Truth Beyond Science

Heidegger referred to his own early work as “hermeneutical philosophy,” and after his “turn” quipped that he wanted to leave the business of hermeneutics to Gadamer. Gadamer himself was never sure whether this was a compliment or a criticism! Nonetheless, Gadamer did develop hermeneutics beyond Heidegger’s use of that term, which can be seen foremost in Gadamer’s unique concept of truth, as developed most fully in Truth and Method.

Originally titled by Gadamer as Foundations of a Philosophical Hermeneutics, Truth and Method is just that. Following Heidegger’s initiative to increase the scope of hermeneutics beyond that of texts, Gadamer endorses the insight that humans are fundamentally beings who are given to understanding. Our task, if we are to truly know ourselves, is to figure out what such understanding entails, taking into account both its possibilities and limitations. Gadamer, however, goes further than Heidegger and asks if this is the case, what specifically does this mean for the humanities (Geisteswissenschaften)? Gadamer’s answer has both negative and positive components. Negatively, Truth and Method is critical of not only the methodologism and scientism underlying the hermeneutics of Dilthey and the phenomenology of Husserl, but also the twentieth century proclivity for positivism and/or naturalism. Yet in his move to put science “in its place,” so to speak, one finds a positive attempt to reinvigorate our appreciation of art, showing not only how it speaks truth but also how it serves as the paragon of truth. He argues not only that meaningful knowledge sought by the humanities is irreducible to that of the natural sciences, but that there is deeper, richer truth that exceeds scientific method. However, this commitment does not mean, as Jürgen Habermas and Paul Ricoeur maintained, that Gadamer opposes truth to method. For such a conclusion misses the crucial point that for Gadamer all forms of methodological truth are dependent on this deeper sense of hermeneutic truth. What sort of truth is it that underlies yet is not limited to natural scientific truth?

Over and against traditional conceptions of truth, Gadamer argues that truth is fundamentally an event, a happening, in which one encounters something that is larger than and beyond oneself. Truth is not the result of the application of a set of criteria requiring the subject’s distanced judgment of adequacy or inadequacy.  Truth exceeds the criteria-based judgment of the individual (although we could say it makes possible such a judgment). Gadamer explains in the last lines of Truth and Method that “In understanding we are drawn into an event of truth and arrive, as it were, too late, if we want to know what we are supposed to believe” (490). Truth is not, fundamentally, the result of an objective epistemic relation to the world (as put forth by correspondence or coherence theories of truth). An objective model of truth assumes that we can set ourselves at a distant from and thus make a judgment about truth using a set of criteria that is fully discernible, separable, and manipulable by us. Gadamer’s point is that there is a more fundamental happening of truth that is irreducible to such methodological applications, which perhaps we could call verisimilitudinous in regards to the deeper, hermeneutic, sense. Gadamer aims not to negate scientific method but to elucidate 1) what makes it possible and 2) the limitations of its scope. Gadamer is interested in dispelling the hubris of science (that is, scientism born of positivism) and not denigrating the practice of science per se. Furthermore, Gadamer took pains to clarify in his foreword to the second edition of Truth and Method that he is not offering a new method for hermeneutics or the social sciences. His work is not prescriptive. But neither is it descriptive of human behavior. He tells us: “My real concern was and is philosophic: not what we do or what we ought to do, but what happens to us over and above our wanting and doing” (xxviii). This statement also reveals the influence that Heidegger’s retrieval of the question of Being had on Gadamer’s thought in general, and his account of truth in particular. Gadamer’s critique of a scientific or modern theory of truth was, like much of Heidegger’s thought, a critique of subjectivism. Specifically, Gadamer maintained that the knower is never able to fully conceptualize and judge his or her own belief structure. Yet Gadamer’s account of truth went further than Heidegger’s and entailed a second claim, namely, that truth is fundamentally practical. Let us take a closer look at each of these two claims.

Regarding his anti-subjectivism, Gadamer describes the event of truth as an experience in which one is drawn away from oneself into something beyond oneself. To experience truth requires losing oneself in something greater and more extensive than oneself. The paradigmatic example of such an anti-subjective experience is play, to which Gadamer devotes quite a bit of space in Truth and Method. In order to appreciate the anti-subjective emphasis of play, it is helpful to understand its “medial” (Truth and Method, 103, 105) nature: players do not direct or control the play but are caught up in it. Play has “primacy over the consciousness of the player” (104), follows its own course, and plays itself, so to speak. Play is not played by a subject but rather absorbs the player into itself. Gadamer’s primary concern is to elucidate what it means to be caught up in the game in a way that diminishes the subjectivity of the player. In fact, the subject of the game is not the player but the game itself. However, this emphasis does not mean that the player relinquishes all power or consciousness and dons a zombie-like state—in which case there would be no mediality. Rather, Gadamer’s point is that play is effortless, without strain, and spontaneous (105), always enticing one into more play. The fact that in play one experiences oneself as in-between oneself and the play, that is, one neither exerts full control nor is passively swept along, reflects its mediality.

The constant back-and-forth movement of play eludes the grasp and guidance of an agent’s will, and yet, at the same time, is seemingly full of initiative. Play succeeds when the player engages in it with ease and where the player is never awkward or removed. But neither is the play excessively competitive. Gadamer’s insistence on the “contested” nature of such movement emphasizes the fact that one always plays with something or someone else. By “contest” Gadamer means to suggest only that play is never the act of a lone individual—not that it is necessarily agonistic. The negative component of competition that some (Lugones) read into Gadamer is difficult to defend given Gadamer’s insistence that the goal of play is not to end the game by winning but to keep on playing. While there is an initial assertive and intentional choice of entering into a game, once the game has gotten underway, being caught up in the game replaces any prior intentionality. To play, as Gadamer suggests, is to choose to give up our choice. In play, one substitutes one’s “free, individual choice,” so to speak, for the experience of a new sort of freedom which entails losing oneself in reciprocal play with someone or something else. The alleged “freedom” to remain isolated, in control, and able to choose is replaced by the freedom found in relinquishing oneself to the play of the game.

In addition to its medial nature, Gadamer highlights a second feature of play, namely “presentation,” which is what ultimately allows Gadamer to explain how play becomes transformed into art. Gadamer insists that human play is always marked by self-presentation: in play we present ourselves as something/someone else. While there is self-presentation in nature, according to Gadamer, human play-as-self-presentation is different:

The self-presentation of human play depends on the player’s conduct being tied to the make-believe goals of the game, but the “meaning” of these does not in fact depend on their being achieved. Rather, in spending oneself on the task of the game, one is in fact playing oneself out. The self-presentation of the game involves the player’s achieving, as it were, his own self-presentation by playing—that is, presenting—something. Only because play is always presentation is human play able to make representation itself the task of the game. (Truth and Method, 108)

What Gadamer is getting at here is that the purpose of play is not a presentation of a final, completed product for a third-party observer. Rather, he clarifies how in play our only goal is to figure out how to represent ourselves so that the game continues, thus recalling the contestial nature of play that requires two and aspires to keep playing. In other words, in true play the goal is not to achieve the prize but to present oneself as something in such a way that furthers the play.

Gadamer describes how play becomes “art” when the presentation is aimed at the absence of the “fourth wall”—that is, the viewer. Whereas in games the presentation is self-contained, in art, play-as-presentation does aim at something beyond itself. The playful self-presentation characterizing mediality gets transformed into pure presentation in art, signifying a potential for truth not found in the anti-subjective dimension of play. However, Gadamer warns, “when we speak of play in reference to the experience of art, this means neither the orientation nor even the state of mind of the creator or of those enjoying the work of art, nor the freedom of subjectivity engaged in play, but the mode of being of the work of art itself” (Truth and Method, 101). To grasp exactly what Gadamer means by “the mode of being of the work of art itself” we can now attend to the second claim Gadamer raises about truth, namely, its practical importance. Art exemplifies how truth is a matter of being spoken to, being claimed, and being changed. The truth emerging from art is an existential, practical one, rather than a purely theoretical one.

For Gadamer, truth is inextricably tied to our ability to recognize “something and oneself” (Truth and Method, 114). Unlike previous theories, however, that tied recognition to the ability to recognize the original presented by art, Gadamer emphasizes the future, rather than the past, as defining recognition. Recognition aimed at the truth of art stems not from its ability to mimic (or correspond to) an original but from its ability to bring to presence that which is truer than the original. To encounter the truth in art is not to look back to an original; art serves not as the mirror to the world-that-is-really-there, but as a means to opening one’s eyes to new ways of seeing and future possibilities. It is new visions not past ones that can count as true, and for this reason Gadamer insists that what is presented in art is actually more true than the alleged original it purports to imitate. But what does this mean and how does it reflect truth’s practical bent? Recognition thus requires more than objective seeing where one brackets one’s subjectivity and remains at an existential distance from the art. Recognition means being played by, drawn into, the work of art in such a way that one’s own being is altered. As Gadamer puts it, our encounter with art that produces truth occurs when we hear the art speaking as if directly to us: “it is not only the ‘This art thou!’ disclosed in a joyous and frightening shock; it also says to us; ‘Thou must alter thy life!’” (Philosophical Hermeneutics, 104). The neutral gaze of aesthetic consciousness affords no truth, for nothing is at stake, nothing is disturbed, and everything is left as it was before. For Gadamer, the truth of art refers to its practical ability to speak to, that is, change, the viewer. Art’s “mode,” then, is “presentation” (Truth and Method, 115) to the extent to which it presents an “essential” truth, where “essence” refers not to a stable, a priori, but to the relation established by our encounter with the art. To lose oneself in the play of art that then leads to a finding and a recognition of oneself—one that activates an envisioning of oneself in the future and not the past—is to experience truth. Gadamer writes, “In being played the play speaks to the spectator through its presentation; and it does so in such a way that, despite the distance between [the play and the spectator], the spectator still belongs to play” (116). The belongingness is not one that suggests a “deep, hidden truth,” as Dreyfus and Rabinow maintain, but rather one in which we experience ourselves made present with the art—which is possible only as we look ahead, envisioning ourselves anew.

To maintain the evential character of truth is to expose the dynamic nature of understanding, specifically in terms of a “double movement” (Barthold). Gadamer’s account of truth requires not only that one be drawn away from oneself and caught up in something larger than oneself, one must also “return to oneself.” Here, the “return to self” means the ability to grasp the meaning for oneself in a way that changes one. As we have seen, Gadamer does not just offer a critique of modern subjectivism, he also argues for the practical moment in which one feels compelled to change one’s life. The anti-subjective implication of Gadamer’s account of truth, to the extent it is a move away from oneself, is suggestive of the Platonic motion of ascendance. And the subsequent impetus for practical application, the return to oneself, reflects the descendance also reminiscent of Plato. If we do not engage in such a dynamic experience, one both in which one is caught up and from which one emerges changed, then one has not experienced truth. This hermeneutic account of truth refrains from explicating the method or the criteria required to arrive at a correct judgment. Instead it attempts to elucidate the more primordial sense of truth that underlies, but does not oppose, traditional accounts of truth like the correspondence and coherence theories.

b. Prejudice, Tradition, Authority, Horizon

In part II of Truth and Method Gadamer develops four key concepts central to his hermeneutics: prejudice, tradition, authority, and horizon. Prejudice (Vorurteil) literally means a fore-judgment, indicating all the assumptions required to make a claim of knowledge. Behind every claim and belief lie many other tacit beliefs;  it is the work of understanding to expose and subsequently affirm or negate them. Unlike our everyday use of the word, which always implies that which is damning and unfounded, Gadamer’s use of  “prejudice” is neutral: we do not know in advance which prejudices are worth preserving and which should be rejected. Furthermore, prejudice-free knowledge is neither desirable nor possible. Neither the hermeneutic circle nor prejudices are necessarily vicious. Against the enlightenment’s “prejudice against prejudice” (272) Gadamer argues that prejudices are the very source of our knowledge. To dream with Descartes of razing to the ground all beliefs that are not clear and distinct is a move of deception that would entail ridding oneself of the very language that allows one to formulate doubt in the first place. To further understand the vital role of prejudices, we must examine the role Gadamer assigns to tradition.

“Tradition,” like “prejudice,” is a term Gadamer develops beyond its everyday meaning. To affirm, as Gadamer does, that one can never escape from one’s tradition, does not mean he is insisting we endorse all traditions writ large. Gadamer is not espousing a conservative approach to tradition that blindly affirms the whole of a tradition and leaves one without recourse to critique it. Critics like Habermas and Ricoeur have faulted Gadamer for failing to insist on a critical response to tradition. These criticisms miss the mark for two reasons. First, accepting the fact that we can never entirely reflect oneself out of tradition does not mean that one cannot change and question one’s tradition. His point is that in as much as tradition serves as the condition of one’s knowledge, the background that instigates all inquiry, one can never start from a tradition-free place. A tradition is what gives one a question or interest to begin with. Second, all successful efforts to enliven a tradition require changing it so as to make it relevant for the current context. To embrace a tradition is to make it one’s own by altering it. A passive acknowledgment of a tradition does not allow one to live within it. One must apply the tradition as one’s own. In other words, the importance of the terms, “prejudice” and “tradition,” for Gadamer’s hermeneutics lies in the way they indicate the active nature of understanding that produces something new. Tradition hands down certain interests, prejudices, questions, and problems, that incite knowledge. Tradition is less a conserving force than a provocative one. Even a revolution, Gadamer notes, is a response to the tradition that nonetheless makes use of that very same tradition. Here we can also perceive the Hegelian influences on Gadamer to the extent that even a rejection of some elements of the tradition relies on the preservation of other elements, which are then understood (that is, taken up) in new ways. Gadamer desires not to affirm a blind and passive imitation of tradition, but to show how making tradition our own means a critical and creative application of it.

Similarly, true authority always requires an active acknowledgment by others. Without such an acknowledgment, one finds not true authority but passive submission resulting in tyranny. For, acknowledgment requires an active implementation of and reflection on the meaning of that authority for oneself—one based in knowledge not ignorance. Hence, understanding always has a built-in possibility for critique as we strive to make something our own and do not simply passively mimic it. Memorizing a text, for example, is no indication that one understands it; one has understood only when one can put the text into one’s own words, enlivening the text and allowing it to speak in new ways. That Gadamer’s point is not a conservative one is seen by the fact that change resulting in a new creation is the necessary result of all understanding.

Gadamer’s attention to the historical nature of understanding is captured by what he terms, “historically effected/effective consciousness” (Wirkungsgeschichtliches Bewusstein). But against historicism’s objectifying tendencies, Gadamer contends that historical situatedness does not result in restrictive limitations. For, limits are precisely what allow one to be open to what is new. It is in this context that one of Gadamer’s most misunderstood terms, namely, the “fusion of horizons,” is discussed. “Horizon” suggests the limits that make perspective possible and is marked by two main features. First, the concept of horizon suggests the situated and perspectival nature of knowing. Just as the visual (that is, literal) horizon provides the boundaries that allow one to see, so the epistemic horizon provides boundaries that make knowledge possible. Just as the literal horizon delimits one’s visual field, the epistemic horizon frames one’s situation in terms of what lies behind (that is, tradition, history), around (that is, present culture and society), and before (that is, expectations directed at the future) one. The concept of horizon thus connotes the way in which a located, perspectival knowing is yet a fecund one: without the limitation of a horizon there would be no seeing. The back- and fore-grounds requisite for knowledge are not hindrances to be overcome. For, the “view from nowhere” sees not; it is blinded by its own solipsism. A horizon, as Gadamer tells us, bespeaks the productively mediated relation between what is distant and near; it enables us to discern both what is close up and what is far away without excluding either of these positions (Truth and Method, 302). We could say that the concept of horizon meaningfully integrates the interpreter’s immediate environs and the more distant world-at-large.

Second, Gadamer stresses the open and dynamic nature of horizons. This point has been neglected in some of the secondary literature devoted to Gadamer’s conception of horizon and for this reason it is important to note that when Gadamer speaks of the horizon it is in a context in which he is trying to explain how we can have an intellectually vital relation with tradition or, as he puts it later, between “text and present”  (306). Against historicism, Gadamer argues that the ability of a contemporary interpreter to understand a text of the past does not presuppose two entirely distinct, reified horizons. It is the work of understanding to expose the unity to what at first glance is taken to be two distinct horizons, that is, past and present. Hence the “fusion” of horizons that signifies understanding. Rather than delineating a fixed and impenetrable space, Gadamer wants to highlight the capaciousness and expansiveness of a horizon: “horizon is. . . something into which we move and that moves with us. Horizons change for a person who is moving” (304). To defend horizons as distinct and fixed affirms the closed (304), incommensurable nature of horizons, where understanding, and thus truth, remains thwarted (303).

Since Gadamer denies the original diremption (separation) of discrete horizons, he rejects the assumption that understanding requires us to transpose ourselves into another, alien horizon. Horizons are not self-contained locations that can be entered into or departed from at will; they are not “objective” locations distinct from us as “subjects.” It is not the case, then, that understanding requires an act of will by which we transpose ourselves into the horizon of the other. The Hegelian themes are clear when Gadamer tells us that the transposition that occurs in the attempt to understand

always involves rising to a higher universality that overcomes not only our own particularity but also that of the other. The concept of “horizon” suggests itself because it expresses the superior breadth of vision that the person who is trying to understand must have. To acquire a horizon means that one learns to look beyond what is close at hand—not in order to look away from it but to see it better, within a larger whole and in truer proportion. (305)

The Hegelian aufhebung (sublation) underlying horizontal fusions means that whenever we are tempted to say that there are two completely distinct and incommensurate horizons we should confess the superficiality and incompleteness of such a description. That is to say, our initial efforts at trying to interpret an ancient text might make it seem as if the text does belong to an entirely different world, and Gadamer does not deny that the foreignness of the text sometimes seems to suggest its complete otherness. Misunderstanding can exacerbate the otherness of the other. But, accepting the initial challenge of difference as entailing ontologically real differences precludes change, and thus understanding. Instead, Gadamer invites us to conceive of difference as a means to transformation, which Gadamer terms “fusion of horizons.” The temptation to treat difference as an impossibility reflects a superficial response and affirms a rigid, reified notion of horizon. Noting the difference of temporally or spatially distant worlds, is, as Gadamer puts it, “only one phase in the process of understanding,” and we must take care not to “solidify” the “self-alienation of past consciousness” (306, 307). If we do so, then we will prevent the “real fusing of horizons. . . which means that as the historical horizon is projected, it is simultaneously superseded” (307). Refusing to reify difference means acknowledging that the process of understanding requires the ability to allow one’s own horizon to shift and change in light of the acknowledgment of the other, and vice versa. True understanding not only begins with difference but also requires all horizons to change; neither one’s own horizon nor that of the other is left intact (306-307). Fusion of horizons is not a war in which the dominant horizon swallows up the weaker one. In keeping with Gadamer’s anti-subjectivism, it is crucial to note that the “fusion of horizons” happens beyond our willing; the expanding of our horizon is not something we can fully control or bring about. Rather, it is through our effort to understand that a new horizon emerges.

But if there are not two reified horizons, neither is there a single, bounded horizon that occludes difference. Fusion refers to the active and the on-going nature of understanding—not a static, hegemonic unity. Any unity wrought by understanding is its effect—not its cause. Furthermore, such unity will never be total: understanding refers to a process not a final end. To defend a mono-culture is akin to positing a single, definite horizon and is thus to deny the very difference that initiates understanding in the first place. The productivity of such difference is attested to by Gadamer’s statement in his “Afterword” to Truth and Method: “what I described as a fusion of horizons was the form in which this unity [of the meaning of a work and its effect] actualizes itself, which does not allow the interpreter to speak of an original meaning of the work without acknowledging that, in  understanding it, the interpreter’s own meaning enters in as well. . . Working out the historical horizon of a text is always already a fusion of horizons” (576, 577).  Acknowledging that one can only access the viewpoint of another from within one’s own horizon is not a totalitarian effort to defend a mono-culture but a humble admission that one never can access directly the other’s perspective. Neither an imposed nor feigned sameness is the starting place; if they were there would be no work for understanding to do. Ascriptions of a mono-horizon belong to historicist positions that fail to note the complex nature of horizons that always, at least potentially, grant provisions for us moving beyond them. Gadamer’s account of horizon emphatically maintains that only where one is open to new horizons emerging—and hence difference—can one claim to understand. It falls to the work of the historical consciousness, which Gadamer seeks to undermine, to defend such a mono-cultural and reified picture of history and tradition. Hence, Gadamer’s theory is not forced to assume either a mono-cultural view of tradition or to posit mono-culture as the telos of understanding. Putting it in a slightly different way: difference is the occasion for—not an impediment to—understanding.

c. Dialectic, Dialogue, Language

Part II of Truth and Method closes with an analysis of Plato’s dialectic and the significance of dialogue for Gadamer’s hermeneutics. Gadamer’s understanding of these terms as well as how they are related bears comment. As we have seen, Gadamer distinguishes between early Platonic, later Platonic, and Hegelian dialectic and relies most heavily on the early Platonic dialectic due to its reliance on Socratic dialogue. The later Platonic and Hegelian dialectic he faults for their propositional and sentential reductionism. For Gadamer, dialectic instructs his own hermeneutics in so far as it suggests a productive tension that, contrary to Hegel's view, is never resolved. The lack of resolution suggests the fecundity of the “chorismos” (the separation between the sensual and transcendent realms) marking human existence and affirms our human status as “in-between.” If Gadamer’s hermeneutics can be called “dialectic” it is in the sense that Gadamer affirms that understanding is inseparable from dialogue and is marked by a constant and productive “chorismatic” tension between these two realms (Barthold).

For Gadamer, as for Plato, dialectic is inseparable from (although not reducible to) dialogue. One can point to four main components of dialogue in Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics. First, a dialogue is focused on die Sache, the subject matter. The aim of dialogue is not to win the other over to one’s side—it is not a debate. Nor does it aim at a subjective understanding of the other. Rather, both parties open themselves to coming to an agreement about the matter itself. Secondly, a dialogue requires that each party possesses a “good-will” to understand, that is, an openness to hear something anew in such a way as to forge a connection with another. Thus one could say that dialogic openness aims at solidarity. Third, a good dialogue entails a willingness to offer reasons and justifications for one’s views. One must be open not only to the voice of the other, but to make the effort to explain oneself to another. Finally, a good dialogue requires a commitment that one “knows one doesn’t know.” Dialogue requires a humble playfulness in which we get caught up and lose ourselves in the connection with another. A good dialogue is one that, like engaging play, is one we want to keep going. Thus we could see that the play of dialogue indicates the central motif of Gadamer’s notion of truth: “To reach an understanding in a dialogue is not merely a matter of putting oneself forward and successfully asserting one’s own point of view, but being transformed into a communion in which we do not remain what we were” (379). The intertwined nature of dialectic and dialogue, combined with dialogue’s connection to solidarity, reflects what Gadamer meant when he referred to his philosophical hermeneutics as “dialectical ethics” (“Gadamer on Gadamer”, 15).

Part III of Truth and Method turns to an analysis of language where Gadamer draws on his early fascination with Socratic dialogue in order to defend the importance of the linguistic nature of human existence. Referencing Augustine and Nicholas of Cusa, he goes on to stress the speculative nature of language in order to contend against those who would reduce language to propositions. Gadamer shows us how meaning comes through linguistic expression that relies on a whole (that is, Being) that is greater than its part (what is expressed in language, for example, propositions). This “totality” makes language possible and functions “not [as] an object but the world horizon that embraces us.” But it is crucial to emphasize that the sense of the speculative and the totality Gadamer insists upon here refuses the Hegelian finality: understanding does not aim at having the final word.

But neither is there the worry that we are somehow trapped inside language. Instead, Gadamer stresses the open and on-going nature of understanding that manifests itself in two ways. First, as we have seen, one is to remain open toward the other in order to keep the conversation going. Second, Gadamer stresses the openness on the part of language, which is never a restrictive, non-porous boundary, but a productive limit that makes possible the continual creation of new words and worlds. The first of these, that is, our openness to the on-going conversation we have with others is made possible by the second, that is, our shared pre-linguistic world of being. Thus when it comes to language, Gadamer refuses to reduce language to propositions—that is, tools that we use objectively. Instead he summons poetry as that which embodies what is essential to all language, namely, its status as “a medium where I and world meet, or, rather, manifest their original belonging together” (Truth and Method, 474). In this section, Gadamer proclaims his famous utterance, “Being that can be understood is language” (474). This claim means neither that everything is language nor that all Being is reducible to language. Language, Gadamer tells us towards the end of this section, is a type of presentation, a coming-into-being, that reveals the unity of beauty (that is, what we desire) and truth (what speaks to and changes us). Language, in other words, makes visible both truth and beauty. In this way, language reflects the hermeneutic experience in terms of being captivated by beauty and changed by truth, a truth that is irreducible to scientific method.

4. Critical Encounters

a. E.D. Hirsch

Two years prior to his 1967 book, Validity and Interpretation, E.D. Hirsch wrote a journal article criticizing Gadamer’s hermeneutics. Against Gadamer, Hirsch argued that meaning can only be found in the author’s intention and thus a good interpretation is one that successfully reconstructs and reproduces this original meaning. He accused Gadamer’s hermeneutics of substituting this sort of reconstruction of authorial intention with the interpreter’s own subjective construction. Essentially, Hirsch rejected Gadamer’s move to replace mimesis with application. Hirsch also attacked Gadamer’s reliance on prejudice, tradition, historicity and his notion of fusion of horizons. None of these notions, according to Hirsch, gives adequate emphasis to the importance of the interpreter suspending and bracketing her own subjective consciousness and taking on that of the author. (Thus Hirsch followed Dilthey’s and Schleiermacher’s emphasis on divining the intention of the author as the method of interpretation.) As a result, Gadamer’s hermeneutics is thought to lose its ability to claim objective status and remains unable to defend itself against charges of relativism. What this criticism overlooks, however, is that Gadamer insists his work is not a prescriptive or normative call to endorse prejudice, tradition or authority. It does not defend the passivity of the interpreter but the active and creative force at play in all interpretation. Neither did Gadamer intend “to offer a general theory of interpretation and a differential account of its methods. . .” Instead, Gadamer maintains that the insights of Truth and Method aim “to discover what is common to all modes of understanding and to show that understanding is never a subjective relation to a given ‘object’ but to the history of its effect; in other words, understanding belongs to the being of that which is understood” (Truth and Method, xxxi). Gadamer nowhere denies the importance of striving to be objective when interpreting a text; what he denies is the sufficiency and primacy of such “objectivity.”

b. Jürgen Habermas

In the nineteen-sixties Gadamer had been a supporter of Jürgen Habermas, urging against Max Horkheimer that Habermas be offered a job at Heidelberg before he had completed his Habilitation. While Habermas and Gadamer were united in their attack on the hubris of positivism, during the seventies an important philosophical disagreement between them took place that served to expand the sphere of Gadamer’s philosophical influence. While there were many fundamental points of agreement between Habermas and Gadamer, such as their starting place in the hermeneutic tradition that attempts a critique of the dominance of natural scientific method as well as their desire to return to the Greek notion of practical philosophy, Habermas argued that Gadamer’s emphasis on tradition, prejudice, and the universal nature of hermeneutics blinded him to ideological operations of power. Habermas interpreted Gadamer as calling for the elimination of method altogether and went on to argue that Gadamer’s hermeneutics thus leaves one without the ability to reflect critically upon the sources of ideology at play in the theoretical and material levels of society. Habermas asserted, “Hermeneutical consciousness is incomplete so long as it has not incorporated into itself reflection on the limit of hermeneutical understanding” (The Hermeneutic Claim to Universality, 302). Essentially, he accused Gadamer of failing to recognize the need to critique tradition, inferring that Gadamer disallows such a critique and endorses a dogmatic stand toward tradition. How do we know that the understanding we arrive at is distortion-free? Gadamer’s appeal to tradition, prejudice, and authority would seem to thwart any such critique. Gadamer, in turn, argued, that to refuse the universal nature of hermeneutics is itself the more dogmatic stance, for in so doing we affirm modernity’s deception that the subject can free itself from the past.

c. Jacques Derrida

While both Gadamer and Derrida were attentive to the role of language in life and philosophy, and both were followers of Heidegger, the content as well as the style of their philosophy differ greatly. For Gadamer, the very possibility of understanding requires a devotion to die Sache, the subject matter. Derrida’s deconstructionist claim is that to assume a subject matter, a singular point unifying the attention of understanding, is to endorse and remain ensnared by a metaphysics of presence. According to Derrida there is no subject matter, no “Truth,” only multiple perspectives and their deferral. In 1981, a “meeting” or “conversation” was arranged between Gadamer and Derrida at the Goethe Institute in Paris. However, what occurred fell far short of anything that could be called a philosophical dialogue. Why? Gadamer’s initial presentation aimed to defend Heidegger against Derrida’s charge that Heidegger fails to achieve the more radical philosophy of Nietzsche who insists that there is not truth, no single correct interpretation or agreement over a singular subject matter. Derrida’s “reply,” however, ignored the main trajectory of Gadamer’s points and instead attacked Gadamer for relying on a Kantian notion of the good will. Since Gadamer had mentioned only once (and in passing) the importance of being open to the other in a dialogue, Derrida seemed to overreach with his charge that Gadamer was therefore defending a Kantian notion of good will. Then, even more puzzlingly, in Derrida’s subsequent presentation, he addressed himself only to Heidegger and Nietzsche and made no mention at all of Gadamer’s hermeneutics. Yet if we characterize Gadamer’s hermeneutics as the elucidation of how understanding can succeed, and if we generalize Derrida’s deconstruction as the exposure of the misunderstandings, ruptures, and deviances that always present themselves when we try to understand, then perhaps, to the extent to which each philosopher embodied his own philosophy, a certain encounter (albeit not a dialogue) between philosophies did in fact occur.

5. Practical Philosophy: Hermeneutics Beyond Gadamer

a. Hermeneutics as Dialogue: Ethical and Political Interventions

Tracing the trajectory of Gadamer’s philosophical career, one might question whether Truth and Method deserves to be called his magnum opus or whether it is not one moment in his more important quest to recover the spirit of Plato.  If we are to take him at his word that Truth and Method offered us the foundations of hermeneutics, then we must ask, what is the magnum opus such a foundation undergirds? It would seem as if practical philosophy is the work, the edifice, Gadamer hoped would be sustained by his “foundations.”  This fact can be substantiated by his 1996 claim: “By hermeneutics I understand the ability to listen to the other in the belief that he could be right” (quoted in Gadamer: A Biography, 250). In other words, Gadamer realizes more fully the universalizing tendency in the history of hermeneutics: the event of understanding occurs not just in the realm of texts, and certainly not just in philosophy, but in the myriad ways we interact with and seek to connect with others.

The eagerness to conceive of the dialogical impetus of hermeneutics as a possible resource for resolving certain contemporary social and political crises in our world is found in much of the secondary literature on Gadamer. Gadamer’s work proves relevant for contemporary issues to the extent to which it neither appeals to prior, transcendent, eternal truths nor devolves into incommensurability. The desire to forge a third way “beyond objectivism and relativism” (Bernstein) captures the move by some thinkers to find social and political relevance in Gadamer’s hermeneutics (Warnke, Sullivan, Dallmayr). Political theorist and philosopher Fred Dallmayr, for instance, drawing on Gadamer, stresses “integral pluralism” as a way to avoid the isolated pluralism resulting from incommensurability. To what extent is it possible to interact rationally and dialogically in order to listen to the other and to advance human understanding that values the whole (that is, community) over the part (individual)? And feminist philosophers Georgia Warnke and Linda Martín Acloff have relied on Gadamer’s hermeneutics in their writings about justice, contemporary social issues, and gender.

b. Twentieth Century Anglo-American Appropriations

While Gadamer’s thought has been primarily formed by his interaction with German and Greek thinkers, it has been taken up by three of the most influential American philosophers of the later twentieth century, namely, the pragmatist Richard Rorty, and the philosophers of language, Robert Brandom and John McDowell. While coming from a very different philosophical tradition than Gadamer, both Brandom and McDowell have argued for the usefulness of Gadamer’s thought for contemporary discussions in philosophy of mind and philosophy of language. Richard Rorty, in his 1979 work, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, was one of the first Anglo-American philosophers explicitly to attest to the import of Gadamer’s hermeneutics. And while the term “hermeneutics” drops out of use in Rorty’s later work, evidence of Gadamer’s continued influence remains. In fact, one can find increasing connections among pragmatism and Gadamer. For example, contemporary American pragmatist Richard Bernstein finds Gadamer’s conception of the fluidity of horizons more promising than that of static paradigms for forging our way through contemporary multiculturalism and globalization. For, Gadamer’s rich and nuanced conception of dialogue avoids promoting either incommensurability or facile dialogue that denies the workings of power in language.

c. Applied Hermeneutics

That Gadamer’s work has also found application in psychology (Chessick), education (Gallagher), ethics (Foster, Smith, Vilhauer), political theory (Dallmayr, Kögler, Sullivan, Warnke), sports (Hyland), and theology (Ringma, Thiselton) affirms Gadamer’s claim that “a good test of the idea of hermeneutics itself” is its ability to find translation in other fields (The Philosophy of Hans-Georg Gadamer, 17). How to make the questions of our history, of our tradition, speak again to us—not solely within the halls of the academy with its “scholarshipism” (as Gadamer terms it) but to the practical concerns of our age? This is the task Gadamer’s hermeneutic philosophy calls us to.  Thus the continued relevance of Gadamer’s thought for contemporary philosophy, particularly of a social and political bent, serves to endorse Gadamer’s own claim about the practical relevance of his hermeneutics: “The hermeneutic task of integrating the monologic of the sciences into the communicative consciousness includes the task of exercising practical, social, and political reasonability. This has become all the more urgent” (Philosophical Apprenticeships, 182).

In closing, we can concur with Robert Dostal who clarifies that although Gadamer himself wrote no ethics or political philosophy per se, there is in his hermeneutics a “basic posture” oriented toward just these concerns, to the extent that he urges us to listen, truly listen, to what the other says in trust that she or he may be right. And that this is a posture that extends beyond the realm of academic philosophy can be seen in Gadamer’s own life. Dostal reflects, “The ethic of this hermeneutic is an ethic of respect and trust that calls for solidarity. Gadamer himself embodies this ethic, not only in his work, but also in his life. All those who have encountered him, whether they find themselves in agreement with him or not, have found him, like the Socrates he so much admired, always ready for conversation” (32). And like Socrates’ death, Gadamer’s death did not put an end to our conversation with him.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Collected Works in German

  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Gesammelte Werke. Tübigen: J.C.B. Mohr (Paul Siebeck).

b. Main Books by Gadamer in English

  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Hegel’s Dialectic: Five Hermeneutical Studies. Trans. P.      Christopher Smith. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1976.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Philosophical Hermeneutics. Trans. and ed. David E. Linge. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1977.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Dialogue and Dialectic. Trans. P. Christopher Smith. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1980.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Philosophical Apprenticeships. Trans. Robert R. Sullivan. Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press, 1985.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Idea of the Good in Platonic-Aristotelian Philosophy. Trans. and with an introduction and annotation by P. Christopher Smith. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Dialogue and Deconstruction. Ed. Diane P. Michelfelder and Richard E. Palmer. Albany: SUNY Press, 1989.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. “Gadamer on Gadamer.” In Gadamer and Hermeneutics, ed. Hugh Silverman. New York: Routledge Press, 1991a.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Plato’s Dialectical Ethics. Trans. Robert M. Wallace. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1991b.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Hans-Georg Gadamer on Education, Poetry, and History. Ed. Dieter Misgeld and Graeme Nicholson. Trans. Lawrence Schmidt and Monica Reuss. Albany: SUNY Press, 1992.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Truth and Method. 2nd ed. Trans. Joel Weinsheimer and Donald G. Marshall. N.Y.: Crossroad, 1992.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Reason in the Age of Science. Trans. Frederick G. Lawrence. Mass.: MIT Press, 1992.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Heidegger’s Ways. Trans. John W. Stanley. Albany: SUNY Press, 1994.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Enigma of Health. Trans. Jason Gaiger and Nicholas Walker. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1996.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Relevance of the Beautiful. Ed. Robert Bernasconi. Trans. Nicholas Walker. N.Y.: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Beginning of Philosophy. Trans. Rod Coltman. N.Y.: Continuum, 1998.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg.. Praise of Theory. Trans. Chris Dawson. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Hermeneutics, Religion, and Ethics. Trans. Joel Weinsheimer. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1999.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Gadamer in Conversation. Ed. and trans. Richard E. Palmer. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2001.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Beginning of Knowledge. Trans. Rod Coltman. N.Y.: Continuum, 2002.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. A Century of Philosophy. Trans. Rod Coltman with Sigrid Koepke. N.Y.: Continuum, 2004.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Gadamer Reader: A Bouquet of the Later Writings. Ed. Richard E. Palmer. Ill.: Northwestern University Press, 2007.

c. Selected Secondary Literature

  • Alcoff, Linda Martín. Visible Identities. New York: Oxford, 2006.
  • Barthold, Lauren Swayne. Gadamer’s Dialectical Hermeneutics. Lanham, MD: Lexington, 2010.
  • Bernstein, Richard. Beyond Objectivism and Relativism. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania, 1983.
  • Brandom, Robert. Tales of the Mighty Dead. Massachusetts:  Harvard University,   2002.
  • Chessick, Richard. “Hermeneutics of Psychotherapists,” American Journal of Psychotherapy 44 (1990), 256-73.
  • Dallmayr, Fred. Integral Pluralism: Beyond Culture Wars. Kentucky: University of Kentucky, 2010.
  • Dostal, Robert J. ed. The Cambridge Companion to Gadamer. New York: Cambridge, 2002.
  • Foster, Matthew. Gadamer and Practical Philosophy. Atlanta: Scholars, 1991.
  • Gallagher, Shaun. Hermeneutics and Education. Albany: SUNY, 1994.
  • Grondin, Jean. Gadamer: A Biography, trans. Joel Weinsheimer. New Haven: Yale University, 2003.
  • Grondin, Jean. Introduction to Philosophical Hermeneutics. New Haven: Yale University, 1994.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. “The Hermeneutic Claim to Universality.” The Hermeneutic      Tradition. Gayle Ormiston and Alan Schrift, ed. Albany: SUNY, 1990.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. “A Review of Gadamer’s Truth and Method.” The Hermeneutic Tradition. Gayle Ormiston and Alan Schrift, ed. Albany: SUNY, 1990.
  • Hahn, Lewis Edwin, ed. The Philosophy of Hans-Georg Gadamer. Chicago: Open Court, 1997.
  • Hirsch, E.D. “Truth and Method in Interpretation.” Review of Metaphysics 18 (1965), 488-507.
  • Hirsch, E.D. Validity in Interpretation. New Haven: Yale University, 1967.
  • Hollinger, Robert, ed. Hermeneutics and Praxis. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame, 1985.
  • Hyland, Drew. Philosophy of Sport. St. Paul, Minn.: Paragon House, 1990.
  • Kögler, Hans Herbert. The Power of Dialogue: Critical Hermeneutics after Gadamer and Foucault. Translated by Paul Hendrickson. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT, 1996.
  • Krajewski, Bruce, ed. Gadamer’s Repercussions. Berkeley: University of California, 2004.
  • Lugones, Maria. “Playfulness, "World"-Traveling, and Loving Perception,” Hypatia 2 (1987), 3-19.
  • McDowell, John. Mind and World. Cambridge, Mass.,: Harvard, 1996.
  • Michelfelder, Diane P. and Richard E. Palmer. Dialogue and Deconstruction: The  Gadamer-Derrida Encounter. Albany: SUNY, 1989.
  • Orozco, Theresa. “The Art of Allusion: Hans-Georg Gadamer’s Philosophical Interventions Under National Socialism,” Radical Philosophy 78 (1996), 17            26.
  • Ringma, Charles Richard. Gadamer’s Dialogical Hermeneutics. Heidelberg: Universitätsverlag C. Winter, 1999.
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. New Jersey: Princeton, 1979.
  • Rorty, Richard. “Being That Can Be Understood Is Language.” Gadamer’s Repercussions. Ed., Bruce Krajewski. Berkeley: University of California, 2004.
  • Smith, P. Christopher. The Ethical Dimension of Gadamer’s Hermeneutical Theory. Research in Phenomenology 18 (1988), 75-91.
  • Sullivan, Robert. Political Hermeneutics. Pa.: Pennsylvania State University, 1989.
  • Thiselton, Anthony C. The Two Horizons. Grand Rapids: W.B. Eerdmans, 1980.
  • Vilhauer, Monica. Gadamer’s Ethics of Play. Lanham, MD: Lexington, 2010.
  • Warnke, Georgia. Gadamer: Hermeneutics, Tradition and Reason. Stanford: Stanford University, 1987.
  • Warnke, Georgia.Walzer, Rawls, and Gadamer: Hermeneutics and Political Theory. In Festivals of Interpretation, ed. Kathleen Wright. Albany: SUNY, 1990.
  • Warnke, Georgia. Justice and Interpretation. Mass.: MIT, 1993.
  • Warnke, Georgia. Legitimate Differences. Berkeley: University of California, 1999.
  • Weinsheimer, Joel C. Gadamer’s Hermeneutics. New Haven: Yale University, 1999.


Author Information

Lauren Swayne Barthold
Gordon College
U. S. A.


Although deconstruction has roots in Martin Heidegger’s concept of Destruktion, to deconstruct is not to destroy.  Deconstruction is always a double movement of simultaneous affirmation and undoing.  It started out as a way of reading the history of metaphysics in Heidegger and Jacques Derrida, but was soon applied to the interpretation of literary, religious, and legal texts as well as philosophical ones, and was adopted by several French feminist theorists as a way of making clearer the deep male bias embedded in the European intellectual tradition.

To deconstruct is to take a text apart along the structural “fault lines” created by the ambiguities inherent in one or more of its key concepts or themes in order to reveal the equivocations or contradictions that make the text possible.  For example, in “Plato’s Pharmacy,” Derrida deconstructs Socrates’ criticism of the written word, arguing that it not only suffers from internal inconsistencies because of the analogy Socrates himself makes between memory and writing, but also stands in stark contrast to the fact that his ideas come to us only through the written word he disparaged (D 61-171).  The double movement here is one of tracing this tension in Plato’s text, and in the traditional reading of that text, while at the same time acknowledging the fundamental ways in which our understanding of the world is dependent on Socrates’ attitude toward the written word.  Derrida points out similar contradictions in philosophical discussions of a preface (by G. W. F. Hegel, D 1-69) and a picture frame (by Immanuel Kant, TP 17-147), which are simultaneously inside and outside the respective works under consideration.

Since the distinction between what is inside the text (or painting) and what is outside can itself be deconstructed according to the same principles, deconstruction is, like Destruktion, an historicizing movement that opens texts to the conditions of their production, their con-text in a very broad sense, including not only the historical circumstances and tradition from which they arose, but also the conventions and nuances of the language in which they were written and the details of their authors’ lives.  This generates an effectively infinite complexity in texts that makes any deconstructive reading necessarily partial and preliminary.

Table of Contents

  1. Destruktion
  2. Deconstruction
    1. Early Formulations
    2. Literary Deconstruction
    3. Contentions and Confrontations
    4. Later Versions
  3. Feminist Deconstruction
  4. References and Further Readings
    1. References
    2. Additional Readings

1. Destruktion

Heidegger’s use of the word Destruktion suffers from the same problem as Edmund Husserl’s use of Intentionalität. Neither is an ordinary German word; both were borrowed from Latin almost as neologisms to express a concept their creators perceived as relatively new to the philosophical domain, only to have the words become confused with their more common cognates when translated into French or English.  The usual German word for “destruction” is “Zerstörung”, but Heidegger’s concept of Destruktion is also closely related to Abbau or dismantling.  Derrida uses the word deconstruction to capture both German terms. (EO 86-6).

In Being and Time, Heidegger says that the purpose of Destruktion is to “arrive at those primordial experiences in which we achieved our first ways of determining the nature of Being—the ways which have guided us ever since” (BT 44).  This is the double gesture referred to above, one that takes apart the European traditions and in so doing finds the basic understanding of Being beneath its surface. This goal separates Destruktion from deconstruction, not because deconstruction is purely negative, but because it has no fixed endpoint or goal.  Deconstruction is always an on-going process because the constantly shifting nature of language means that no final meaning or interpretation of a text is possible.  Subsequent ages, grounded in a different language and different ways of life, will always see something different in a text as they deconstruct it in the context of the realities with which they live.  What is meant by “the written word”, for example, has already evolved substantially since Derrida wrote “Plato’s Pharmacy” due to the explosion in electronic media.  All deconstruction can reveal are temporary and more or less adequate truths, not more primordial or deeper ones.  For Heidegger, on the other hand, the “primordial experiences” of Being revealed through Destruktion result in a single interpretation that offers a more authentic alternative to philosophy’s misunderstanding of the temporality and historicality of human existence.

Temporality and historicality are essential components of Dasein, Heidegger’s term for human existence, because it is “thrown projection”, that is, an entity necessarily oriented toward an unknown future, but always based on a past for which it is not itself fully responsible and which it can never fully know.  Time, then, is not only a category of experience (as in Kant), but the very core of our existence. As beings in a present moment are  defined in terms of a past that creates our possibilities and a future into which we project them.  On a larger scale, this temporality of Dasein (as opposed to Hegelian Spirit) is what creates history; our ability to project forward and interpret backwards not only the circumstances of our lives, but also those of the entire social world to which we belong.  For Heidegger, Destruktion of the traditions in that social world can lead us back to a past that can be re-interpreted in ways that reveal the deeper understanding of Being hidden in the earliest texts of the European tradition; it  can offer ways to project a different, more authentic future for Dasein based on the new way of seeing the past.

2. Deconstruction

a. Early Formulations

As already noted, deconstruction differs from Destruktion in that it has no fixed or expected endpoint or map, but is rather a potentially infinite process.  Although obviously a critical tool, it also lacks the sense, evident in Heidegger, that the text to be deconstructed is part of how European thought has somehow gone wrong and needs correction.  This is because deconstruction rejects both the idea that there is a fixed series of eras (ancient, medieval, modern) in European history that mark a downward path, and the idea that there is some determinate way in which that path might be reversed, by a re-interpretation of early Greek philosophy.  Rather, Derrida insists that what he deconstructs are texts that he “loves” (EO 87) and they  are vital parts of our intellectual world, with a view to revealing their underlying complexities and hidden contradictions.  He does not seek to undo Kant, for example, or interpret his writings in ways closer to Derrida’s own vision of what philosophy should be, but rather shows us the ways in which Kant both changes and continues the metaphysical tradition, as well as the ways in which Kant’s texts undo themselves along the same “fault lines” that have undermined that tradition throughout its history.

In 1967, Derrida offered this definition:

To ‘deconstruct’ philosophy, thus, would be to think—in the most faithful, interior way—the structured genealogy of philosophy’s concepts, but at the same time to determine—from a certain exterior that is unqualifiable or unnameable by philosophy—what this history has been able to dissimulate or forbid, making itself into a history by means of this. . .motivated repression (P 6).

What is outside of, or excluded from the realm dominated by the philosophical tradition, although unnamed in it, provides a vantage point and a key with which to find the flaws and lacunae that domination seeks to hide.  The opposition between the spoken and written word in Plato, the text and its introduction in Hegel, the painting and its frame in Kant belong to a series of oppositions (good/evil, mind/body, male/female, center/margin, necessary/contingent, and so forth .) that run though and in many ways structure the European philosophical tradition.  Each of these pairs is also a hierarchy meant to exclude both the non-dominant member of the pair (the body, the female, the margin, the contingent) and anything outside the opposition (the ambiguous, the borderline, the hybrid) from the philosophical realm.  These hierarchical oppositions, in turn, create the basis for political hierarchy and social domination (male/female, freeman/slave, propertied/landless, Christian/other, citizen/immigrant), power differentials that motivate the repression to which Derrida refers. This is why deconstruction denies the possibility of some pre-Socratic “primordial experience” of Being to be found through dismantling the metaphysical tradition which could then solve the problems that tradition has created, because that experience, too, would be subject to deconstruction along these same lines.

What deconstruction reveals, among other things, is that the repression that is necessary for creating a history of philosophy is in large part a repression of what philosophy itself cannot control, of what escapes the grasp of philosophy while being part of it.  The fault lines that deconstruction follows are the traces left inside philosophy by what it must define as exterior to it in order to be philosophy.  Derrida’s early work connects these fault lines to what is represented by the written word:  our inability to control or limit the meaning that might be given to our words because of the historical development of language, the ambiguity of linguistic meaning, and the ability of written text to be excerpted, reproduced and read in contexts we can neither imagine nor control (as opposed, supposedly, to the immediate and limited context of the spoken word).  This is why any text can be deconstructed (even Friedrich Nietzsche’s fragmentary message “I have forgotten my umbrella” in Spurs), but canonical texts (Plato, Kant, Hegel, later Heidegger himself) offer the richest and most productive grounds for deconstruction.  We learn more about ourselves by seeing the traces of a fear of absolute loss that motivate the Aufhebung in Hegel’s texts, than we might from finding the same anxiety in the writing of someone whose influence on European philosophy (and politics) has been less profound.

As an example of deconstruction here, however, it seems advisable to choose a text closer to Nietzsche’s umbrella, than Hegel’s phenomenology of Spirit.  The Truth in Painting takes its title from a letter in which Paul Cézanne tells Émile Bernard, “I owe you the truth in painting [la verité en peinture] and I will tell it to you.”  Derrida points out that the philosophy of language would assert that in writing this, Cézanne must have known what he meant, but in fact the sentence itself has no determinate meaning.  “The truth in painting” escapes and exceeds the boundaries philosophy wants to draw with regard to language because it has at least four meanings, none of which is reducible to any of the others:  1) the truth about truth itself to be found in or through a painting or other work of art, such as the truth Heidegger finds in Van Gogh’s painting of the shoes in “Origin of the Work of Art”; 2) the truth of the painting as painting, that is, how “true to life” it is, how well it succeeds in representing what it is meant to represent; 3) the truth about its object that can be found through the painting, such as when a portrait lays bare the character of its subject; and 4) the truth about painting in the sense of what is true in painting as a human enterprise or art form.

This ambiguity of the French sentence is compounded by the fact that Cézanne promises, not to paint the truth, but to tell or say it in language, thus linking text and painting in a complex nexus of possible meanings and realizations.  There is, and can be, no single meaning of this sentence simply because of the rather ordinary (but untranslatable) French phrase “en peinture”.  As is sometimes the case with the deconstruction of such partial and cryptic texts, Derrida’s target here is not Cézanne’s words themselves, but rather the account of truth and promises (the implicit debt in Cézanne’s “I owe you”) found in contemporary philosophy of language.  Not only does this sentence fail traditional philosophical tests for having a truth value, due to its ambiguity, it also fails to have the conditions of satisfaction, with which more recent philosophy of language hoped to replace those tests and determine whether Cézanne paid his “debt”.  By deconstructing the phrase “the truth in painting”, Derrida hopes to underscore the pragmatic reality that how language functions as a living phenomenon makes it impossible to develop purely formal criteria for identifying or cataloguing true statements.

b. Literary Deconstruction

One notable fact about the reception of deconstruction in the United States was its relatively early acceptance by departments of literature compared to departments of philosophy.  Undoubtedly , there are several reasons for this, but one may be that, as Geoffrey Hartman notes, “Deconstructive criticism does not present itself as a novel enterprise” because the ambiguity and contextuality, the interplay of the spoken and written word, that deconstruction emphasizes in philosophical texts are both more obvious and more acknowledged in literary ones.  At the same time, deconstruction, by foregrounding the fact that “Everything we thought of as spirit, or meaning separable from the letter of the text, remains within an ‘intertextual’ sphere” (DC viii), opened important channels of communication between philosophy and literary studies.

The tools of deconstruction and the sorts of truths they reveal, are similar in both spheres.  The basic strategy is still to follow the trace of a key ambiguity or blind spot through the text to illuminate hierarchical oppositions it relies on and the fault lines along which it can be undone, while still acknowledging its power and importance in European thought.  Ernest Jones’ classic psychoanalytic reading of “Hamlet”, for instance, is deconstructive in that it foregrounds the suppressed patricide in “Julius Caesar” (Shakespeare ignores the fact that Brutus was Caesar’s illegitimate son, thus implying an invariant (beloved-)father/(legitimate-)son pair), and then uses this omission as one key in tracing the Oedipal fault line in the later play.  Here deconstruction yields, not a new meaning to “Hamlet”, as one could say Derrida does in his discussion of prefaces in Hegel, but a new richness to our understanding of Shakespeare’s work.

This highlights the fact that deconstruction plays a different role in literature than in philosophy.  Deconstruction tends to be used in literary theory in arguments between and among theorists about the value of their theories, rather than about the value of the texts under discussion.  One deconstructs Kant to argue with Kant (and perhaps others), but one doesn’t deconstruct Shakespeare to argue with Shakespeare (or, as we saw above, Cézanne to argue with Cézanne).  In addition, literary deconstruction is about texts that are of a different nature than the deconstruction itself, while the deconstruction of one philosophical text results in another philosophical text.  This makes it much clearer in philosophy that deconstructive texts can themselves be, in fact must be, deconstructed.  What literary deconstruction produces, on the other hand, is not itself literature.  This doesn’t mean that literary deconstructions cannot be deconstructed, but that they are not deconstructed in the same way that they are constructed. The context in which such a deconstruction might be carried out, is quite different from the context in which the original deconstructive text was created.  Put another way, literary deconstruction assumes the possibility and reality of literature in at least some sense of the term, whereas deconstruction as a philosophical enterprise questions, at its most basic level, the possibility of philosophy itself.

c. Contentions and Confrontations

Deconstruction has always been engaged in active dialogue with other contemporary approaches to philosophical and literary texts.  The most productive of these conversations have been with those schools of thought that are closest in history and orientation to deconstruction, often sharing its roots in Heidegger’s work.  At the same time, the issues raised in those debates are often similar to those raised by more strident critics completely opposed to the deconstructive enterprise.  A brief summary of some of the most notable confrontations, across more than twenty years, offers an opportunity to consider the most powerful objections to deconstruction, from the end of the 20th century, onwards.

The 1981 conversation between deconstruction (in the person of Derrida) and hermeneutics (in the person of Hans-Georg Gadamer) raises at least two recurrent themes.  The first has already been indirectly discussed—the charge that deconstruction is a negative enterprise.  Gadamer, who speaks of the debate as one between Heidegger’s reading of Nietzsche and Derrida’s, calls deconstruction a “repudiation” of the “language of concepts” that is the legacy of European philosophy (DD 101).  As already noted, however, deconstruction is always a question and a double movement aware of its own debt to the texts it deconstructs, and so never a repudiation.  The second charge is that deconstruction does not allow for the possibility that a word can be redefined or used independently of its traditional metaphysical meaning.  Gadamer raises this point with regard to “understanding” in general, “self-understanding” and “dialectic”, asking why these terms must be considered part of metaphysics when used in the way he uses them.  This argument is weakened, however, by Gadamer’s own reference to “an older wisdom that speaks in living language”, thus affirming the continuing echo of the tradition even in the most carefully redefined or well-intentioned philosophical terms (DD 95-99).

Although directed at postmodernism, the 1990 exchange between major feminist theorists recorded in Feminist Contentions raises some of the same themes as the earlier debate, but also bears directly on the feminist reception of deconstruction in the United States. The feminists who argue here against postmodernism, and by extension against deconstruction, make the case that political action requires a stronger basis than either of these is capable of providing.  Seyla Benhabib, for instance, acknowledges that subjectivity is largely shaped by language and other symbolic structures, but insists that there must remain some sense in which “we are both author and character at once” in our own life histories.  She argues that, in order to be politically effective in the face of women’s sometimes tenuous sense of self and lack of autonomy, feminist philosophy requires a core of irreducible selfhood and agency that deconstruction would deny (FC 21-22).  As Judith Butler points out however, this line of argument precludes the possibility of any “political opposition” to the self as traditionally understood because it allows us no political way to move beyond the traditional metaphysical dualisms (author/character, authority/submission, self/other, autonomy/heteronomy, and back to, e.g.,  male/female) (FC 36).

In her response to Butler, Benhabib emphasizes another recurring theme in debates about deconstruction:  “how can one be constituted by discourse without being determined by it?”  That is, how does the deconstructive understanding of the self as opaque and internally divided provide a starting point for social and political critique (FC 110)?  We have seen, however, that for deconstruction discourse is neither monolithic nor unequivocal, which means that it cannot be fully determinative of the self, either.  The very lack of a permanent, substantial self in the usual sense that Benhabib and others criticize in deconstruction, is at the same time, what creates the possibility of agency outside and beyond the world of fixed essences and meanings envisioned by the philosophical tradition.  (A Cartesian self, Descartes himself tells us in the Meditations, is most free when it has no choice but to follow Reason.)  The complexities here can be seen in the way deconstructive texts themselves often grapple with these same questions about the possibility of personal and political agency (see below) but, as might be expected, come up with no final answer.

The 1993 confrontation between deconstruction and the neo-pragmatism of Richard Rorty raises similar points.  Rorty accuses Derrida of being a humanist in the sense of a follower of the Enlightenment, while he suggests that deconstruction itself diverts attention, at least in the United States, away from real politics (which he later defines as “a matter of pragmatic, short-term reforms and compromises”).  He embraces the deconstructive understanding of language, which he likens to Ludwig Wittgenstein’s, but denies that the consequences of a Wittgensteinian theory of language can be meaningfully applied to the natural sciences.  He argues instead for an empiricist and naturalist position in science, that he sees to be in conflict with the “transcendental” side of deconstruction, that is, its continuing concern with metaphysics and the resultant tendency to see science as a form of metaphysical materialism (DP 14-17).

In response, Derrida accepts some commonality between pragmatism and deconstruction, but defends the asking of the transcendental question and the refusal to do away with metaphysics altogether as a defense against “empiricism, positivism, and psychologism”.  He also refers to his work on the inevitability of violence in the political realm, which counters the tacit optimism in Rorty’s political views (DP 81-83).  Derrida’s argument is that the political state relies on the rule of law, and the rule of law, in turn, relies on the power to punish, that is, on violence, which is therefore the ground of the political state.  His later work on immigration also underscores the dependence of the political state on a sharp and often violent boundary between who has the full rights of  democratic citizenship (“fraternity” in the French context)--that is, the citizen, the landowner, the freeman, all always male--and who does not (aliens, peasants, slaves, women).

Philosophy in a Time of Terror (2003) is not a direct confrontation between deconstruction and Jürgen Habermas’ theory of communicative action, but illustrates the continuity of themes among those critical of deconstruction over the preceding twenty years.  In the context of 9/11, Habermas’ remarks acknowledges the structural violence that underlies the successful societies of what he terms the West. But then questions the “deconstructivist suspicion”, that the model of communication that works reasonably well in everyday situations, will no longer be adequate when we move to larger conversations between political and social groups.  He argues that insisting dialogue is “nothing but” displaced violence obscures the potential of dialogue for ending violence without creating new pretexts for it (PT 35-38).  He similarly objects to the deconstruction of the concept of tolerance as always an exercise of the power to tolerate or not, because the toleration demanded in a democracy is one between equals and thus mutual rather than paternalistic.  He also finds a certain circularity in deconstruction, since it seems to rely on the same universalism, tolerance, and so forth , it seeks to undo.

As already noted, however, this double gesture is itself the essence of deconstruction.  Derrida, for his part, points out that the “major events” that provoke the kind of communication between groups Habermas refers to are more often, if not exclusively, those that directly affect Europe and the United States and not, for instance, an equal number of deaths in Somalia or the Sudan.  What is threatened by 9/11, he goes on, is exactly a particular context of interpretation that has dominated the dialogues between “the West” and its Other, legitimating some forms of violence while disallowing others (PT 92-93).  He reasserts his reading of toleration as an exercise of paternalistic, or specifically religious, power (PT 127).  One does not ask an oppressed group to “tolerate” their oppressors; it is something asked only of those in a position to grant or deny such toleration.  He also questions the possibility of an actually existing democracy, due to the violence of power relations (PT 120), much less the possibility of a democracy in which different groups would be sufficiently equal for toleration to be genuinely mutual.

This last contestation between Habermas and Derrida, is indirect because it was in the form of separate interviews, illustrates three main points.  One, already noted, is the continuity of objections to deconstruction over an extended period of time, primarily focused around issues of the everyday vs. the transcendental (a dualism that deconstruction seeks to undermine) and the political implications of deconstruction.  The second is the lingering impression that these confrontations rely more on contradiction than on real attempts at communication, or even argument.  A method that questions everything, including itself and even the concept of method, as deconstruction does, leaves critics little concrete substance to criticize, except the circularity and the double gesture that deconstruction embraces.  At the same time, the third point to be noted is the increasing engagement of deconstruction with politics after 1989, if not directly in response to these challenges, at least in the context of their persistence.

d. Later Versions

In the 2001 interview about 9/11, Derrida makes a series of statements about the nature of deconstruction that suggest both similarities and differences from his earlier pronouncements.  He defines the deconstructive philosopher as someone “who analyzes and then draws the practical and effective consequences of the relationship between our philosophical heritage and the structure of the still dominant juridico-political system that is so clearly undergoing mutation” (PT 106).  The explicit emphasis on both politics and the pragmatic is as marked as the much more obscure references that were more common thirty years earlier.  At the same time, he emphatically repeats the double gesture of affirming his faith in and allegiance to the idea of an international law that is, like democracy, unrealizable and, again like democracy, undecidable, that is, impossible even to envision without contradiction (PT 115).  Finally, he refers back to “Plato’s Pharmacy” to suggest that the political state is, like writing for Socrates, “at once remedy and poison”, something we can live neither with, because of its inherent violence, nor without, because only the state can protect us from the violence it engenders (PT 124).

Deconstruction retains it critical edge well into the 21st century, even when directed against closely allied texts.  For instance, the 2001 address Derrida gave upon receiving the Theodor Adorno Prize turns back on Adorno himself, specifically on his privileging of the German language even as he champions globalism and a united Europe.  This deconstruction centers in the familiar manner on the untranslatably ambiguous French word fichu (n. neckerchief; adj., lost or done for).  The word appears in French in a letter to Adorno’s wife by Walter Benjamin, who uses it in describing a dream where he speaks of “changing a poem into a fichu” in the first sense (neckerchief or scarf).  This fichu is then associated in the dream with the letter “d”, which Derrida suggests might refer to a name Benjamin used in signing letters, or to his sister or his wife, both named Dora.  Derrida then goes on to point out that “dora” in Greek can mean scorched or scratched skin, hence linking it to fichu in the second sense, but also to Auschwitz and to 9/11, which was Adorno’s birthdate (PM 164-181).  In an excellent example of the deconstruction of a deconstruction, the English translator of this address inserts a footnote here to add that “dor”, meaning gift, is also part of Adorno’s given name, Theodor, “gift of the gods” (PM 203).

Clearly gender plays a central role in the deconstructive process in “Fichus”.  If the fault line or rifts in traditional philosophical texts are the result of attempts to exclude from philosophy what it cannot control, Woman (i.e., Adorno’s wife, Benjamin’s wife and sister, any woman who wears a fichu) will be one of the constant sites of deconstructive undoing.  Death also becomes of increasing importance in deconstruction, as shown in Derrida’s late works focused on the death of the father, the mother, and eventually his own.  In addition to the connection psychoanalysis makes between women and death, both these themes are revealed by deconstruction to be at the root of what the philosophical tradition has always sought to avoid.  Writing, for Socrates, can be deceptive (like a woman), or wander from the source like an illegitimate son (born to such a woman).   Socrates does not say either “woman” or “death”,  but the hatred of writing, deconstruction argues, as of all manifestations of our embodiment in Plato and the tradition he inaugurates, is fundamentally a “motivated repression” of what always exceeds philosophy, the philosopher’s body, his desires, and ultimately his death.

3. Feminist Deconstruction

The connection between deconstruction and feminist readings of the European tradition, although implicit in Derrida’s work since “Plato’s Pharmacy” (1972), was made explicit in a 1981 interview with Christie V. McDonald called “Choreographies”.  Much earlier, however, feminist theorists in France were incorporating deconstructive strategies in their work.  In their 1975 book The Newly Born Woman, for instance, Hélène Cixous and Catherine Clément underscore the series of hierarchical oppositions (good/bad, life/death, day/night, culture/nature, male/female) that provide most, if not all, of the key terms that open a text to a deconstructive reading.  The list, which carries a footnoted reference to Derrida, is not, as we have already seen, an innocent one.  In Plato the pair speech/writing is one central theme; in the ancient Greeks generally, active/passive; in religion God/man, later Christian/Jew; in René Descartes and the moderns mind/body; in colonial or racist ideology Western/Oriental, white/black.  In a further repetition of Derrida’s method, Cixous and Clément’s move is not to reverse these hierarchies, which would only create another system of power.  They seek instead to think in a third way.  This third way is called “bisexuality” here, meaning the refusal to focus on a single sexual organ in favor of undifferentiated pleasures of the flesh (NBW 84-85).  This move to rethink sexuality as part of a deconstructive strategy, drawing on psychoanalysis and anthropological texts such as Marcel Mauss’ “Essay on the Gift”, is a common theme in French feminist deconstruction, also found, for example, in the work of Luce Irigaray and Julia Kristeva (and in later texts by Derrida himself).

Given the importance of Sigmund Freud’s work to this strain of feminist deconstruction, Sarah Kofman’s 1980 book on Freud provides a detailed example of the potential power of this method for feminist thought.  One major fault line she examines is the concept of “penis envy”, a phenomenon that is supposedly central to the process that transforms bisexual creatures into women.  Kofman notes, however, that this process amounts to transforming into a woman “a little girl who has first been a little boy” because within psychoanalysis pre-Oedipal bisexuality affirms the “original predominance of masculinity (in both sexes)” (EW 111-122).  She draws extensively on Freud’s biography, as well as his texts, to make clear how he characterizes women as defined both by lack (their penis envy) and their excess (“her narcissistic self-sufficiency and her indifference” which leaves the male “emptied of this original narcissism in favor of the love object” [EW 52]), another classic deconstructive self-contradiction.  Ultimately, she argues that penis envy, Freud’s “idée fixe”, and indeed his whole account of femininity and female sexuality, “allows him to blame nature for the cultural injustice by which man subordinates woman’s sexual desires to his”.  She also notes Freud’s surprise that, given all this, women might be hostile to men or frigid (EW 208-209).

In The Man of Reason (1984) Genevieve Lloyd undertakes a feminist reading on a larger historical scale, deconstructing (although she does not use that term) major philosophical texts from Plato to Simone de Beauvoir along a fault line that would equate reason with the masculine.  The hierarchical dualism found in deconstruction (speech/writing, male/female, and so forth.)  in epistemologically-oriented English language philosophy take the form rational/irrational, knowledge/ignorance, and so forth.  Lloyd traces the ways in which these last two pairs maintained a powerfully gendered meaning as the concept of Reason itself evolved through the history of European philosophy.  After 1600, public/private and universal/particular became politically important additions to the list; in the twentieth century existentialism adds transcendence/embodiment.  Most important, Lloyd says, has been the underlying pair superior/inferior.  As we have already seen, whatever is on the masculine side of the dichotomy is assumed, simply from that fact, to have value; whatever is the feminine side, to have none.  Again, like Derrida, Cixous and Clément, Lloyd rejects a move to reverse this polarity because “ironically, it [would] occur in a space already prepared for it by the intellectual tradition it seeks to reject” (MR 105).  Perhaps more optimistic than her French counterparts, Lloyd ends with her own version of the deconstructive double gesture:  “Philosophy has defined ideals of Reason through exclusions of the feminine.  But it also contains within it the resources for critical reflection on those ideals and on its own aspirations” (MR 109).

4. References and Further Readings

a. References

  • Benhabib, Seyla, Judith Butler, Drucilla Cornell, and Nancy Fraser. Feminist Contentions: A Philosophical Exchange. New York: Routledge, 1995. (FC)
  • Bloom, Harold, Paul de Man, Jacques Derrida, Geoffrey Hartman, and J. Hillis Miller. Deconstruction and Criticism. New York: The Seabury Press,1979. (DC)
  • Borradori, Giovanna. Philosophy in a Time of Terror: Dialogues with Jürgen Harbermas and Jacques Derrida. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003. (PT)
  • Cixous, Hélène, and Catherine Clément. The Newly Born Woman, Betsy Wing, trans. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1986. (NBW)
  • Critchley, Simon, Jacques Derrida, Ernesto Laclau, and Richard Rorty. Deconstruction and Pragmatism, Chantal Mouffe, ed. New York: Routledge, 1996. (DP)
  • Derrida, Jacques. Positions, Alan Bass, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981. (P)
  • Derrida, Jacques. Dissemination, Barbara Johnson, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981. (D)
  • Derrida, Jacques. The Ear of the Other: Otobiography, Transference, Translation, Christie V. McDonald, ed., Peggy Kamuf, trans. NewYork: Schocken, 1985. (EO)
  • Derrida, Jacques. The Truth in Painting, Geoff Bennington and Ian McLeod, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987. (TP)
  • Derrida, Jacques, and Christie V. McDonald. “Choreographies”, in Feminist Interpretations of Jacques Derrida, Nancy J. Holland, ed. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1997.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Paper Machine, Rachel Bowlby, trans. Palo Alto, CA: Stanford University Press, 2005. (PM)
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Words of Descartes, Volume I, Elizabeth S. Haldane and G. R. T. Ross, trans. (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1911).
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time, John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson, trans. New York: Harper, 1962. (BT)
  • Heidegger, Martin. “The Origin of the Work of Art” in Poetry, Language, Thought, Albert Hofstadter, trans. New York: Harper, 1971.
  • Jones, Ernest. Hamlet and Oedipus. New York: Doubleday, 1954.
  • Kofman, Sarah. The Enigma of Woman: Woman in Freud’s Writings, Catherine Porter, trans. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1985. (EW)
  • Lloyd, Genevieve. The Man of Reason: “Male” and “Female” in Western Philosophy. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984. (MR)
  • Michelfelder, Diane P., and Richard E. Palmer, eds. Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1989. (DD)

b. Additional Readings

  • Armour, Ellen T.  Deconstruction, Feminist Theology, and the Problem of Difference. Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1999.
    • Excellent, but dense, example of the political use of deconstruction.
  • Bordo, Susan R.  The Flight to Objectivity:  Essays on Cartesianism & Culture.  Albany, NY:  State University of New York Press, 1987.
    • Excellent, accessible feminist deconstruction of Descartes.
  • Cornell, Drucilla.  Beyond Accommodation:  Ethical Feminism, Deconstruction, and the Law. Lanham, MD:  Rowman & Littlefield, 1999.
    • Excellent, but dense, example of the use of deconstruction in legal theory.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Writing and Difference, Alan Bass, trans.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1978.
    • Early deconstructions of Foucault, Hegel, Husserl, and others.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Margins – Of Philosophy, Alan Bass, trans.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1982.
    • Early deconstructions of Heidegger, Hegel, and J. L. Austin.
  • Derrida, Jacques, and Anne Dufourmantelle.  Of Hospitality, Rachel Bowlby, trans. Palo Alto, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2000.
    • Addresses issues of gender, immigration, and the political state.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Rogues:  Two Essays on Reason, Pascale-Anne Brault and Michael Naas.  Palo Alto, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2005.
    • Excellent political and feminist late deconstruction.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Psyche:  Inventions of the Other, Volume II, Peggy Kamuf and Elizabeth Rottenber, eds.  Stanford, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2008.
    • Includes both “Geschlecht” articles on Heidegger and gender, plus other important papers from 1998-2003.
  • Fraser, Nancy.  Unruly Practices:  Power, Discourse and Gender in Contemporary Social Theory.  Minneapolis:  University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
    • A major feminist theorist who is critical of deconstruction.
  • Kofman, Sarah.  Selected Writings, Thomas Albrecht, ed., with Georgia Albert and Elizabeth Rotten berg.   Stanford, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2007.
  • Moi, Toril, ed.  The Kristeva Reader.  New York:  Columbia University Press, 1986.
  • Sellers, Susan, ed.  The Hélène Cixous Reader.  New York:  Routledge, 1994. (CR)
  • Silverman, Hugh J., and Gary Aylesworth, eds.   The Textual Sublime:  Deconstruction and its Differences.   Albany, NY:  State University of New York Press, 1990.
    • Several interesting articles on deconstruction, including one by Paul DeMan.
  • Taylor, Mark C., ed.  Deconstruction in Context:  Literature and Philosophy.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1986.
    • Collection of philosophical writings from Kant onward that provides some of the historical context for deconstruction.
  • Whitford, Margaret, ed.  The Irigaray Reader.  Malden, MA:  Blackwell, 1991.

Author Information

Nancy J. Holland
Hamline University
U. S. A.

Phenomenology and Natural Science

Phenomenology provides an excellent framework for a comprehensive understanding of the natural sciences. It treats inquiry first and foremost as a process of looking and discovering rather than assuming and deducing. In looking and discovering, an object always appears to a someone, either an individual or community; and the ways an object appears and the state of the individual or community to which it appears are correlated.

To use the simplest of examples involving ordinary perception, when I see a cup, I see it only through a single profile. Yet to perceive it as real rather than a hallucination or prop is to apprehend it as having other profiles that will show themselves as I walk around it, pick it up, and so forth. No act of perception – not even a God’s – can grasp all of a thing’s profiles at once. The real is always more than what we can perceive.

Phenomenology of science treats discovery as an instrumentally mediated form of perception. When researchers detect the existence of a new particle or asteroid, it assumes these will appear in other ways in other circumstances – and this can be confirmed or disconfirmed only by looking, in some suitably broad sense. It is obvious to scientists that electrons appear differently when addressed by different instrumentation (for example, wave-particle duality), and therefore that any conceptual grasp of the phenomenon involves instrumental mediation and anticipation. Not only is there no “view from nowhere” on such phenomena, but there is also no position from which we can zoom in on every available profile. There is no one privileged perception and the instrumentally mediated “positions” from which we perceive constantly change.

Phenomenology looks at science from various “focal lengths.” Close up, it looks at laboratory life; at attitudes, practices, and objects in the laboratory. It also pulls back the focus and looks at forms of mediation – how things like instruments, theories, laboratories, and various other practices mediate scientific perception. It can pull the focus back still further and look at how scientific research itself is contextualized, in an environment full of ethical and political motivations and power relations. Phenomenology has also made specific contributions to understanding relativity, quantum mechanics, and evolution.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Historical Overview
  3. Science and Perception
  4. General Implications
    1. The Priority of Meaning over Technique
    2. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical
    3. The priority of situation over abstract formalization
  5. Layers of Experience
    1. First Phase: Laboratory Life
    2. Second Phase: Forms of Mediation
    3. Third Phase: Contextualization of Research
  6. Phenomenology and Specific Sciences
    1. Relativity
    2. Quantum Mechanics
    3. Evolution
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Phenomenology provides an excellent starting point, perhaps the only adequate starting point, for a comprehensive understanding of the natural sciences: their existence, practices, methods, products, and cultural niches. The reason is that, for a phenomenologist, inquiry is first and foremost a question of looking and discovering rather than assuming and deducing. In looking and discovering, an object is always given to a someone – be it an individual or community – and the object and its manners of givenness are correlated. In the special terminology of phenomenology, this is the doctrine of intentionality (for example, see Cairns 1999). This doctrine has nothing to do with the distinction between “inner” and “outer” experiences, but is a simple fact of perception. To use the time-honored phenomenological example, even when I see an ordinary object such as a cup, I apprehend it only through a single appearance or profile. Yet for me to perceive it as a real object – rather than a hallucination or prop – I apprehend it as having other profiles that will show themselves as I walk around it, pick it up, and so forth, each profile flowing into the next in an orderly, systematic way. I do more than expect or deduce these profiles; the act of perceiving a cup contains anticipations of other acts in which the same object will be experienced in other ways. That’s what gives my experience of the world its depth and density. Perhaps I will discover that my original perception was misled, and my anticipations were mere assumptions; still, I discover this only through looking and discovering – through sampling other profiles. In science, too, when researchers propose the existence of a new particle or asteroid, such a proposal involves anticipations of that entity appearing in other ways in other circumstances, anticipations that can be confirmed or disconfirmed only by looking, in some suitably broad sense (Crease 1993). In ordinary perception, each appearance and profile (noema) is correlated with a particular position of the one who apprehends it (noesis); a change in either one (the cup turning, the person moving) affects the profile apprehended. This is called the noetic-noematic correlation. In science, the positioning of the observer is technologically mediated; what a particle or cell looks like depends in part on the state of instrumentation that mediates the observation.

Another core doctrine of phenomenology is the lifeworld (Crease 2011). Human beings, that is, engage the world in different ways. For instance, they seek wealth, fame, pleasure, companionship, happiness, or “the good”. They do this as children, adolescents, parents, merchants, athletes, teachers, and administrators. All these ways of being are modifications of a matrix of practical attachments that human beings have to the world that precedes any cognitive understanding. The lifeworld is the technical term phenomenologists have for this matrix. The lifeworld is the soil out of which grow various ways of being, including science. Understanding photosynthesis or quantum field theory, for instance, is only one – and very rare – way that human beings interact with plants or matter, and not the default setting. Humans have to be trained to see the world that way; they have to pay a special kind of attention and pursue a special kind of inquiry. Thus the subject-inquirer (again, whether individual or community) is always bound up with what is being inquired into by practical engagements that precede the inquiry, engagements that can be altered by and in the wake of the inquiry. It is terribly tempting for metaphysicians to “kick away the ladder of lived experience” from scientific ontology as a means to gain some sort of privileged access to the world that bypasses lifeworld experience, but this condemns science to being “empty fictions” (Vallor 2009).

The aim of phenomenology is to unearth invariants in noetic-noematic correlations, to make forms or structures of experience appear that are hidden in ordinary, unreflective life, or the natural attitude. Again, the parallel with scientific methodology is uncanny; scientific inquiry aims to find hidden forms or structures of the world by varying, repeating, or otherwise changing interventions into nature to see what remains the same throughout. Phenomenologists seek invariant structures at several different phases or levels – including that of the investigator, the laboratory, and the lifeworld - and can examine not only each phase or level, but the relation of each to the others. Over the last hundred years, this has generated a vast and diverse body of literature (Ginev 2006; Kockelmans & Kisiel 1970; Chasan 1992; Hardy and Embree 1992; McGuire and Tuchanska 2001; Gutting 2005).

2. Historical Overview

Phenomenology started out, in Husserl’s hands, well-positioned to develop an account of science. After all, Husserl was at the University of Göttingen during the years when David Hilbert, Felix Klein, and Emmy Noether were developing and extending the notion of invariance and group theory. Husserl not only had a deep appreciation for mathematics and natural science, but his approach was allied in many key respects with theirs, for he extended the notion of invariance to perception by viewing the experience of an object as of something that remains the same in the flux of changing sensory conditions produced by changing physical conditions. This may seem far-removed from the domain of mathematics but it is not. Klein's Erlanger program viewed mathematical objects as not representable geometrically all at once but rather in definite and particular ways, depending on the planes on which they were projected; the mathematical object remained the same throughout different projections. In an analogous way, Husserl’s phenomenological program viewed a sensuously apprehended object as not given to an experiencing subject all at once but rather via a series of adumbrations or profiles, one at a time, that depend on the respective positioning of subject and object. The “same” object – even light of a certain wavelength – can look very different to human observers in different conditions. What is different about Husserl’s program, and may make it seem removed from the mathematical context, is that these profiles are not mathematical projections but lifeworld experiences. What remained to be added to the phenomenological approach to create a fuller framework for a natural philosophy of science was a notion of perceptual fulfillment under laboratory conditions, and of the theoretical planning and instrumental mediation leading to the observing of a scientific object. The “same” structure – for example, a cell – will look very different using microscopes of different magnification and quality, and phenomenology easily provides an account for this (Crease 2009).

Despite this promising beginning, many phenomenologists after Husserl turned away from the sciences, sometimes even displaying a certain paternalistic and superior attitude towards them as impoverished forms of revealing. This is unwarranted. Husserl’s objection to rationalistic science in the Crisis of the European Sciences was after all not to science but to the Galilean assumption that the ontology of nature could be provided by mathematics alone, bypassing the lifeworld (Gurwitsch 1966, Heelan 1987). And Heidegger’s objection, in Being and Time, most charitably considered, was not to theoretical knowledge, but to the forgetting of the fact that it is a founded mode in the lifeworld, to be interpreted not merely as an aid to disclosure but as a special and specialized mode of access to the real itself. Others to follow, including Gadamer and  Merleau-Ponty, for various reasons did not pursue the significance of phenomenology for natural science.

Science also lagged behind other areas of phenomenological inquiry for historical reasons. The dramatic success of Einstein’s theory of general relativity, in 1919, brought “a watershed for subsequent philosophy of science" that proved to be detrimental to the prospects of phenomenology for science (Ryckman 2005). Kant’s puzzling and ambiguous doctrine of the schematism – according to which intuitions, which are a product of sensibility, and categories, which are a product of understanding, are synthesized by rules or schemata to produce experience – had nurtured two very different approaches to the philosophy of science. One, taken by logical empiricists, rejected the schematism and treated sensibility and the understanding as independent, and the line between the intuitive and the conceptual as that between experienced physical objects and abstract mathematical frameworks. The empiricists saw these two as linked by rules of coordination that applied the latter to the former. Such coordination – the subjective contribution of mind to knowledge – produced objective knowledge. The other, more phenomenological route was to pursue the insight that experience is possible only thanks to the simultaneous co-working of intuitions and concepts. While some forms and categories are subject to replacement, producing a “relativized a priori” (my conception of things like electrons, cells, and simultaneity may change) such forms and categories make experience possible. Objective knowledge arises not by an arbitrary application of concepts to intuitions – it is not just a decision of consciousness – but is a function of the fulfillment of physical conditions of possible conscious experience; scientists look at photographic plates or information collected by detectors in laboriously prepared conditions that assure them that such information is meaningful and not noise. Husserl’s phenomenological approach to transcendental structures, though, must be contrasted with Kant’s, for while Kant’s transcendental concepts are deduced, Husserl’s are reflectively observed and described. However, following the stunning announcement of the success of general relativity in 1919, which seemed to destroy transcendental assumptions about at least the Euclidean form of space and about absolute time, logical empiricists were quick to claim it vindicated their approach and refuted not only Kant but all transcendental philosophy. "Through Einstein … the Kantian position is untenable," Schlick declared, “and empiricist philosophy has gained one of its most brilliant triumphs.”  But the alleged vanquishing of transcendental philosophy and triumph of logical empiricism’s claims to understand science was due to “rhetoric and successful propaganda” rather than argument (Ryckman 2005). For as other transcendental philosophers such as Ernst Cassirer, and philosophically sophisticated scientists such as Hermann Weyl, realized, in making claims about the forms of possible phenomena general relativity called for what amounted to a revision, rather than a refutation, of Kant’s doctrine; how we may experience spatiality in ordinary life remains unaffected by Einstein’s theory. But the careers of both Cassirer and Weyl took them away from such questions, and nobody else took their place.

3. Science and Perception

One way of exhibiting the deep link between phenomenology and science is to note that phenomenology is concerned with the difference between local effects and global structures in perception. To use the time-honored example of perceiving a cup through a profile again: Grasping it under that particular adumbration or profile is a local effect, though what I intend is a global structure – the phenomenon – with multiple horizons of profiles. Phenomenology aims to exhibit how the phenomenon is constituted in describing these horizons of profiles. But this of course is closely related to the aim of science, which seeks to describe how phenomena (for example, electrons) appear differently in different contexts – and even, in the case of general relativity, incorporates a notion of invariance into the very notion of objectivity itself (Ryckman 2005). An objective state of affairs, that is, is one that has the same description regardless of whether the frame of reference from which it is observed is accelerating or not.

In science, however, perceiving (observing) is mediated by theory and instruments. Thanks to theories, the lawlike behavior of scientific phenomena (for example, how electrons behave in different conditions) is represented or “programmed” and then correlated with instrumental techniques and practices so that a phenomenon appears. The theory (for example, electromagnetism) thus structures both the performance process thanks to which the phenomenon appears, and the phenomenon itself. Read noetically, with respect to production, the theory is something to be performed; read noematically, with respect to the product, it describes the object appearing in performance. A theory does not correspond to a scientific phenomenon; rather, the phenomenon fulfills or does not fulfill the expectations of its observation raised by the theory. Is this an electron beam or not?  To decide that, its behavior has to be evaluated. Theory provides a language that the experimenter can use for describing or recognizing or identifying the profiles. For the theorist, the semantics of the language is mathematical; for the experimenter, the semantics are descriptive and the objects described are not mathematical objects but phenomena – bodily presences in the world. Thus the dual semantics of science (Heelan 1988); a scientific word (such as ‘electron’) can refer to both an abstract term in a theory and to a physical phenomenon in a laboratory. The difference is akin to that between a ‘C’ in a musical score and a ‘C’ heard in a concert hall. Conflating these two usages has confused many a philosopher of science. But our perception of the physical phenomenon in the laboratory has been mediated by the instruments used to produce and measure it (Ihde 1990).

By adding theoretical and experimental mediation to Husserl’s account of what is “constitutive” of perceptual horizons (Husserl 2001, from where the following quotations are taken except where noted), one generates a framework for a phenomenological account of science. To grasp a scientific object, like a perceptual object, as a presence in the world, as “objective,” means, strangely enough, to grasp it as never totally given, but as having an unbounded number of profiles that are not simultaneously grasped. Such an object is embedded in a system of “referential implications” available to us to explore over time. And it is rarely grasped with Cartesian clarity the first time around, but “calls out to us” and “pushes us” towards appearances not simultaneously given. A new property, for example parity violation, is detected in one area of particle physics – but if it shows up here it should also show up there even more intensely and dramatically. Entities, that is, show themselves as having further sides to be explored, and as amenable to better and better instrumentation. Phenomena even as it were call attention to their special features – strangeness in elementary particles, DNA in cells, gamma ray bursters amongst astronomical bodies – and recommends these features to us for further exploration. “There is a constant process of anticipation, of preunderstanding.”  With sufficient apprehension of sampled profiles, “The unfamiliar object is … transformed …into a familiar object.”  This involves development both of an inner horizon of profiles already apprehended, already sampled, and an external of not-yet apprehended profiles. But the object is never fully grasped in its complete presence, horizons remain, and the most one can hope for is for a thing to be given optimally in terms of the interests for which it is approached. And because theory and instruments are always changing, the same object will always be grasped with new profiles. Thus, Husserl’s phenomenological account readily handles the often vexing question in traditional philosophy of science of how “the same” experiment can be “repeated.”  It equally readily handles the even more troublesome puzzle in traditional approaches of how successive theories or practices can refer to the same object. For just as the same object can be apprehended “horizontally” in different instrumental contexts at the same time, it can also be apprehended “vertically” by successively more developed instrumentation. Husserl, for instance, refers to the “open horizon of conceivable improvement to be further pursued” (Husserl Crisis #9a). Newer, more advanced instruments will pick out the same entity (for example, an electron), yield new values for measurements of the same quantities, and open up new domains in which new phenomena will appear amid the ones that now appear on the threshold. Today’s discovery is tomorrow’s background.

The basic account of perception given above has been further elaborated in the context of group theory by Ernst Cassirer in a remarkable article (Cassirer 1944). Cassirer extends the attempts of Helmholtz, Poincaré and others to apply the mathematical concept of group to perception in a way that makes it suitable to the philosophy of science. Group theory may seem far from the perceptual world, Cassirer says. But the perceptual world, like the mathematical world, is structured; it possesses perceptual constancy in a way that cannot be reduced to “a mere mosaic, an aggregate of scattered sensations” but involve a certain kind of invariance. Perception is integrated into a total experience in which keeping track of “dissimilarity rather than similarity” is a hallmark of the same object. The cup is going to look different as the light changes and as I move about it. “As the particular changes its position in the context, it changes its “aspect.”  Thus, Cassirer writes, “the ‘possibility of the object’ depends upon the formation of certain invariants in the flux of sense-impressions, no matter whether these be invariants of perception or of geometrical thought, or of physical theory. The positing of something endowed with objective existence and nature depends on the formation of constants of the kinds mentioned …. The truth is that the search for constancy, the tendency toward certain invariants, constitutes a characteristic feature and immanent function of perception. This function is as much a condition of perception of objective existence as it is a condition of objective knowledge.”  The constitutive factor of objective knowledge, Cassirer concludes, “manifests itself in the possibility of forming invariants.”  Again, one needs to flesh out such an approach with account of fulfillment as mediated both theoretically and practically.

4. General Implications

The above, it will be seen, has three general implications for philosophy of science:

a. The Priority of Meaning over Technique.

In contrast to positivist-inspired and much mainstream philosophy of science, a phenomenological approach does not view science as pieced together at the outset from praxes, techniques, and methods. Praxes, techniques, and methods – as well as data and results – come into being by interpretation. The generation of meaning does not move from part to whole, but via a back-and-forth (hermeneutical) process in which phenomena are projected upon an already-existing framework of meaning, the assumptions of which are at least partially brought into question, and by this action further reviewed and refined within the ongoing process of interpretation. This process is amply illustrated by episode after episode in the history of science. Relativity theory evolved as a response to problems and developments experienced by scientists working within Newtonian theory.

b. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical

The framework of meaning mentioned above in terms of which phenomena are interpreted is not comprised merely of tools, texts, and ideas, but involves a culturally and historically determined engagement with the world which is prior to the subject and object separation. On the one hand, this means that the meanings generated by science are not ahistorical forms or natural kinds that have a transcendent origin. On the other hand, it means that these meanings are also not arbitrary or mere artifacts of discourse; science has a “historical space” in which meanings are realized or not realized. Results are right or wrong; theories are adjudicated as true or false. Later, as the historical space changes, the “same” theory (or more fully developed versions thereof) may be confirmed by different results inconsistent with previous confirmations of the earlier version. What a “cell” is may look very different depending on the techniques and instruments used to apprehend it, but what is happening is not a wholesale replacement of one picture or theory by another, but expanding and evolving knowledge (Crease 2009).

c. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical

Truth always involves a disclosure of something to someone in a particular cultural and historical context. Even scientific knowledge can never completely transcend these culturally and historically determined involvements, leaving them behind as if scientific knowledge consisted in abstractions viewed from nowhere in particular. The particularity of the phenomena disclosed by science is often disguised by the fact that they can show themselves in many different cultural and historical contexts if the laboratory conditions are right, giving rise to the illusion of disembodied knowledge.

5. Layers of Experience

These three implications suggest a way of ordering the kinds of contributions that a phenomenology can make to the philosophy of science. For there are several different phases – focal lengths, one might say – at which to set one’s phenomenology, and it is important to distinguish between them. The focal length can be trained within the laboratory on laboratory life, and investigate the attitudes, practices, and objects encountered in the laboratory. These, however, are nested in the laboratory environment and in the structure of scientific knowledge, which is their exterior expression. Another phase concerns the forms of mediation, both theoretical and instrumental, and how these contextualize the phase just mentioned of attitudes, practices, and objects, and how these are related to their exterior. This phase is nested in turn in another kind of environment, the lifeworld itself, with its ethical and political motivations and power relations. The contributions of phenomenology to the philosophy of science is first of all to describe these phases and how they are nested in each other, and then to describe and characterize each. A philosophical account of science cannot begin, nor is it complete, without a description of these phases.

a. First Phase: Laboratory Life

One phase has to do with specific attitudes, practices, or objects encountered by a researcher doing research in the laboratory environment – with the phenomenology of laboratory perception. Inquiry is one issue here. Conventional textbooks often treat the history of science as a sequence of beliefs about the state of the world, as if it were like a series of snapshots. This creates problems having to do with accounting for how these beliefs change, how they connect up, and what such change implies about continuity of science. It also rings artificial from the standpoint of laboratory practice. A phenomenological approach, by contrast, considers the path of science as rather like an evolving perception, as a continual process that cannot be neatly dissected into what’s in question and what not, what you believe and what you do not. Affects of research is another issue. The moment of experience involves more than knowledge, global or local, more than iterations and reiterations. Affects like wonder, astonishment, surprise, incredulity, fascination, and puzzlement are important to inquiry, in mobilizing the transformation of the discourse and our basic way of being related to a field of inquiry. They indicate to us the presence of something more than what’s formulated, yet also not arbitrary. When something unexpected happens, it is not a matter of drawing a conceptual blank. When something unexpected and puzzling happens in the lab, it involves a discomfort from running into something that you think you should understand and you do not. Taking that discomfort with you is essential to what transformations ensue. Other key issues of the phenomenology of laboratory experience include trust, communication, data, measurement, and experiment (Crease 1993). Experiment is an especially important topic. For there is nothing automatic about experimentation; experiments are first and foremost material events in the world. Events to not produce numbers – they do not measure themselves – but do so only when an action is planned, prepared, and witnessed. An experiment, therefore, has the character of a performance, and like all performances is a historically and culturally situated hermeneutical process. Scientific objects that appear in laboratory performances may have to be brought into focus, somewhat like the ship that Merleau-Ponty describes that has run aground on the shore, whose pieces are at first mixed confusingly with the background, filling us with a vague tension and unease, until our sight is abruptly recast and we see a ship, accompanied by release of the tension and unease (Crease 1998). In the laboratory, however, what is at first latent in the background and then recognized as an entity belongs to an actively structured process. We are staging what we are trying to recognize, and the way we are staging it may interfere with our recognition and the experiment may have to be restaged to bring the object into better focus.

b. Second Phase: Forms of Mediation

Second order features have to do with understanding the contextualization of the laboratory itself. For the laboratory is a special kind of environment. The laboratory is like a garden, walled off to a large extent from the wider and wilder surrounding environment outside. Special things are grown in it that may not appear in the outside world, but yet are related to them, and which help us understand the outside world. To some extent, the laboratory can be examined as the product or embodiment of forms discursive formations imposing power and unconditioned knowledge claims (Rouse 1987). But only to a limited extent. For the laboratory is not like an institution in which all practices are supposed to work in the same way without changing. It thus cannot be understood by studying discursive formations of power and knowledge exclusively; it is unlike a prison or military camp. A laboratory is a place designed to make it possible to stage performances that show themselves at times as disruptive of discourse, to explore such performances and make sure there really is a disruption, and then to foster creation of a new discourse.

c. Third Phase: Contextualization of Research

A third phase has to do with the contextualization of research itself, with approaches to the whole of the world, and with understanding why human beings have come to privilege certain kinds of inquiry over others. The lifeworld – a kind of horizon or atmosphere in which we think, pre-loaded with powerful metaphors and images and deeply embedded habits of thought – has its own character and changes over time. This character affects everyone in it, scientists and philosophers who think about science. The conditions of the lifeworld can, for instance, seduce us into thinking that only the measurable is the real. This is the kind of layer addressed by Husserl’s Crisis (Husserl 1970), Heidegger’s “The Question Concerning Technology,” (Heidegger 1977) and so forth. The distinction between the second and third phases thus parallels the distinction in sociology of science between micro-sociology and macro-sociology.

6. Phenomenology and Specific Sciences

Phenomenology has also been shown to contribute to understanding certain features or developments in contemporary theories which seem of particular significance for science itself, including relativity, quantum mechanics, and evolution.

a. Relativity

Ryckman (2005) highlights the role of phenomenology in understanding the structure and implications of general relativity and of certain other developments in contemporary physics. The key has to do with the role of general covariance, or the requirement that objects must be specified without any reference to a dynamical background space-time setting. Fields, that is, are not properties of space-time points or regions, they are those points and regions. The result of the requirement of general covariance is thus to remove the physical objectivity of space and time as independent of the mass and energy distribution that shapes the geometry of physical space and time. This, Ryckman writes, is arguably its “most philosophically significant aspect," for it specifies “what is a possible object of fundamental physical theory.”  The point was digested by transcendental philosophers who could understand relativity. One was Cassirer, who saw that covariance could not be treated as a principle of coordination between intuitions and formalisms, and thus was not part of the “subjective” contribution to science, as Schlick and his follower Hans Reichenbach were doing. Rather, it amounted to a restriction on what was allowed as a possible object of field theory to begin with. The requirement of general covariance meant that relativity was about a universe in which objects did not flit about on a space-time stage, but were that stage. Ryckman’s book also demonstrates the role of phenomenology in Weyl’s classic treatment of relativity, and in his formulation of the gauge principle governing the identity of units of measurement. Phenomenology thus played an important role in the articulation of general relativity, and certain concepts central to modern physics.

b. Quantum Mechanics

Phenomenology may also contribute to explaining the famous disparity between the clarity and correctness of the theory and the obscurity and inaccuracy of the language used to speak about its meaning. In Quantum Mechanics and Objectivity (Heelan 1965) and other writings (Heelan 1975), Heelan applies phenomenological tools to this issue. His approach is partly Heideggerian and partly Husserlian. What is Heideggerian is the insistence on the moment prior to object-constitution, the self-aware context or horizon or world or open space in which something appears. The actual appear­ing (or phenomenon) to the self is a second moment. This Heelan analyses in a Husserlian way by studying the intentionality structure of object constitution and insisting on the duality therein of its (embodied subjective) noetic and (embodied objective) noematic poles. “The noetic aspect is an open field of connected scientific questions addressed by a self-aware situated researcher to empirical experience; the noematic aspect is the response obtained from the situated scientific experiment by the experiencing researcher. The totality of actual and possible answers constitutes a horizon of actual and possible objects of human knowledge and this we call a World.”  (Heelan 1965, x; also 3-4). The world then becomes the source of meaning of the word “real,” which is defined as what can appear as an object in the world. The ever-changing and always historical laboratory environment with all its ever-to-be-updated instrumentation and technologies belongs to the noetic pole; it is what makes the objects of science real by bringing them into the world in the act of measurement. Measure­ment involves “an interaction with a measuring instrument capable of yielding macroscopic sensible data, and a theory capable of explaining what it is that is measured and why the sensible data are observable symbols of it” (Heelan 1965, 30-1). The difference between quantum and classical physics does not lie in the intervention of the observer’s subjectivity but in the nature of the quantum object: “[W]hile in classical physics this is an idealised normative (and hence abstract) object, in quantum physics the object is an individual instance of its idealised norm” (Heelan 1965, xii). For while in classical physics deviations of variables from their ideal norms are treated independently in a statistically based theory of errors, the variations (statistical distribution) of quantum measurements are systematically linked in one formalism. The apparent puzzle raised by the “reduction of the wave packet” is thus explained via an account of measurement. In the “orthodox” interpretation, the wave function is taken to be the “true” reality, and the act of measurement is seen as changing the incoming wave packet into one of its component eigen functions by an anonymous random choice. The sensible outcome of this change is the eigenvalue of the outgoing wave function which is read from the measuring instrument. (An eigen function, very simply, is a function which has the property that, when an operation is performed on it, the result is that function multiplied by a constant, which is called the eigenvalue.) The agent of this transformation is the human spirit or mind as a doer of mathematics. Heelan also sees this process as depending on the conscious choice and participation of the scientist-subject, but through a much different process. The formulae relate, not to the ideal object in an absolute sense, apart from all human history, culture, and language, but to the physical situation in which the real object is placed, yielding a particular instance of an ensemble or system that admits of numerous potential experimental realizations. The reduction of the wave packet then “is nothing more than the expression of the scientist’s choice and implementation of a measuring process; the post-measurement outcome is different from the means used to prepare the pure state” prior to the implementation of the measurement (Heelan 1965, 184). The wave function describes a situation which is imperfectly described as a fact of the real world; it describes a field of possibilities. That does not mean there is more-to-be-discovered (“hidden variables”) which will make it a part of the real world, nor that only human participation is able to bring it into the real world, but that what becomes a fact of the real world does so by being fleshed out by an instrumental environment to one or another complementary presentations. Heelan’s work therefore shows the value of Continental approaches to the philosophy of science, and exposes the shortcomings of approaches to the philosophy of science which relegate such themes to “somewhere between mysticism and crossword puzzles” (Heelan 1965, x).

c. Evolution

One of the ­most significant discover­ies of 20th century phe­nomenology was of what is variously called em­bodiment, lived body, flesh, or animate form, the experiences of which are that of a unified, self-aware being, and which cannot be understood apart from reflection on con­crete human experience. The body is not a bridge that connects subject and world, but rather a primordial and unsurpassab­le unity productive of there being persons and worlds at all. Husserl was aware even of the significance of evolution and move­ment. His use of the expression “animate organism” betrays a recognition that he was discussing “something not exclusive to humans, that is, something broader and more funda­mental than human animate organism” (Sheets-Johnstone 1999, 132); thus, a need to discuss matters across the evolutionary spec­trum. Failing to examine our evolutionary heritage, in fact, means misconceiving the wellsprin­gs of our humanity (Sheets-Johnstone 1999). Biologists who developed phenomenological treatments of animal behavior include von Uxhull, to whom Heidegger refers in the section on animals in Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics, and Adolph Portmann, both of whom discussed the animal’s umwelt. And Sheets-Johnstone has emphasized that phenome­nology needs to ­examine not only the ontogenet­ic dimension B infant behavior B but also the phylogenetic one. ­­­­­­If we treat human animate form as unique we shirk our phenomenologic­al duties and end up with incomplete and distorted accounts containing implicit and unexamined notions. “[G]enuine understandings of consciousness demand close and serious study of evolution as a history of animate form” (Sheets-Johnstone 1999, 42).

7. Conclusion

Developing a phenomenological account of science is important for the philosophy of science insofar as it has the potential to move us beyond a dead-end in which that discipline has entrapped itself. The dead-end involves having to choose between: on the one hand, assuming that a fixed, stable order pre-exists human beings that is uncovered or approximated in scientific activity; and on the other hand, assuming that the order is imposed by the outside. Each approach is threatened, though in different ways, by the prospect of having to incorporate a role for history and culture. Phenomenology is not as threatened, for its core doctrine of intentionality implies that parts are only understood against the background of wholes and objects against the background of their horizons, and that while we discover objects as invariants within horizons, we also discover ourselves as those worldly embodied presences to whom the objects appear. It thus provides an adequate philosophical foundation for reintroducing history and culture into the philosophy of the natural sciences.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Babich, Babette, 2010. “Early Continental Philosophy of Science,” in A. Schrift, ed., The History of Continental Philosophy, V. 3, Durham: Acumen, 263-286.
  • Cairns, Dorion, 1999. “The Theory of Intentionality in Husserl,” ed. by L. Embree, F. Kersten, and R. Zaner, Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology 32: 116-124.
  • Cassirer, E. 1944. “The Concept of Group and the Theory of Perception,” tr. A. Gurwitsch, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, pp. 1-35.
  • Chasan, S. 1992. “Bibliography of Phenomenological Philosophy of Natural Science,” in Hardy & Embree, 1992, pp. 265-290.
  • Crease, R. 1993. The Play of Nature. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Crease, R. ed. 1997. Hermeneutics and the Natural Sciences. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Crease, R. 1998. “What is an Artifact?”  Philosophy Today, SPEP Supplement, 160-168.
  • Crease, R. 2009. “Covariant Realism.”  Human Affairs 19, 223-232.
  • Crease, R. 2011. “Philosophy Rules.”  Physics World, August 2011.
  • Ginev, D. 2006. The Context of Constitution: Beyond the Edge of Epistemological Justification. Boston: Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science.
  • Gurwitsch, A. 1966. “The Last Work of Husserl,” Studies in Phenomenology and Psychology, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1966, pp. 397-447.
  • Gutting, G. (ed.). 2005  Continental Philosophy of Science. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Hardy, L., and Embree, L., 1992. Phenomenology of Natural Science. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Heelan, P. 1965. Quantum Mechanics and Objectivity. The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Heelan, P. 1967. Horizon, Objectivity and Reality in the Physical Sciences. International Philosophical Quarterly 7, 375-412.
  • Heelan, P. 1969. The Role of Subjectivity in Natural Science, Proc. Amer. Cath. Philos. Assoc. Washington, D.C.
  • Heelan, P. 1970a. Quantum Logic and Classical Logic: Their Respective Roles, Synthese 21: 2 - 33.
  • Heelan, P. 1970b. Complementarity, Context-Dependence and Quantum Logic. Foundations of Physics 1, 95-110.
  • Heelan, P. 1972. Toward a new analysis of the pictorial space of Vincent van Gogh. Art Bull. 54, 478-492.
  • Heelan, P. 1975. Heisenberg and Radical Theoretical Change. Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenchaftstheorie 6, 113-136, and following page 136.
  • Heelan, P. 1983. Space-Perception and the Philosophy of Science. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Heelan, P. 1987. “Husserl’s Later Philosophy of Science,” Philosophy of Science 54: 368-90.
  • Heelan, P. 1988. “Experiment and Theory: Constitution and Reality,” Journal of Philosophy 85, 515-24.
  • Heelan, P. 1991. Hermeneutical Philosophy and the History of Science. In Nature and Scientific Method: William A. Wallace Festschrift, ed. Daniel O. Dahlstrom. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 23-36.
  • Heelan, P. 1995 An Anti-epistemological or Ontological Interpretation of the Quantum Theory and Theories Like it, in Continental and Postmodern Perspectives in the Philosophy of Science, ed. by B. Babich, D. Bergoffen, and S. Glynn. Aldershot/Brookfield, VT: Avebury Press, 55-68.
  • Heelan, P. 1997. Why a hermeneutical philosophy of the natural sciences? In Crease 1997, 13-40.
  • Heidegger, M. 1977. The Question Concerning Technology, tr. W. Lovitt. New York: Garland.
  • Husserl, E. 1970. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, tr. D. Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Husserl, E. 2001. Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic, tr. A. Steinbock. Boston: Springer.
  • Ihde, D. 1990. Technology and the Lifeworld. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Kockelmans, J. and Kisiel, T., 1970. Phenomenology and the Natural Sciences. Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Mcguire, J. and Tuschanska, B. 2001. Science Unfettered: A Philosophical Study in Sociopolitical Ontology. Columbus: Ohio University Press.
  • Michl, Matthias, Towards a Critical Gadamerian Philosophy of Science, MA thesis, University of Auckland, 2005.
  • Rouse, J. 1987. Knowledge and Power: Toward a Political Philosophy of Science. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Ryckman, T. 2005. The Reign of Relativity: Philosophy in Physics 1915-1925. New York: Oxford.
  • Seebohm, T. 2004. Hermeneutics: Method and Methodology. Springer.
  • Sheets-Johnstone, M. 1999. The Primacy of Movement. Baltimore: Johns Benjamins.
  • Ströker, Elisabeth 1997. The Husserlian Foundations of Science. Boston: Kluwer.
  • Vallor, Shannon, 2009. “The fantasy of third-person science: Phenomenology, ontology, and evidence.”  Phenom. Cogn. Sci. 8: 1-15.


Author Information

Robert P. Crease
Stony Brook University
U. S. A.

The Frankfurt School and Critical Theory

The Frankfurt School, also known as the Institute of Social Research (Institut für Sozialforschung), is a social and political philosophical movement of thought located in Frankfurt am Main, Germany. It is the original source of what is known as Critical Theory. The Institute was founded, thanks to a donation by Felix Weil in 1923, with the aim of developing Marxist studies in Germany. The Institute eventually generated a specific school of thought after 1933 when the Nazis forced it to close and move to the United States, where it found hospitality at Columbia University, New York.

The academic influence of the “critical” method is far reaching in terms of educational institutions in which such tradition is taught and in terms of the problems it addresses. Some of its core issues involve the critique of modernities and of capitalist society, the definition of social emancipation and the perceived pathologies of society. Critical theory provides a specific interpretation of Marxist philosophy and reinterprets some of its central economic and political notions such as commodification, reification, fetishization and critique of mass culture.

Some of the most prominent figures of the first generation of Critical Theorists are Max Horkheimer (1895-1973), Theodor Adorno (1903-1969), Herbert Marcuse (1898-1979), Walter Benjamin (1892-1940), Friedrich Pollock (1894-1970), Leo Lowenthal (1900-1993), Eric Fromm (1900-1980). Since the 1970s, the second generation has been led by Jürgen Habermas who has greatly contributed to fostering the dialogue between the so called “continental” and “analytical” tradition. This phase has also been substantiated by the works of Klaus Günther, Hauke Brunkhorst, Ralf Dahrendorf, Gerhard Brandt, Alfred Schmidt, Claus Offe, Oskar Negt, Albrecht Wellmer and Ludwig von Friedeburg, Lutz Wingert, Josef Früchtl, Lutz-Bachman. More generally, it is possible to speak of a “third generation” of critical theorists, symbolically represented in Germany by the influential work of Axel Honneth. The philosophical impact of the school has been worldwide. Early in the first decade of the twenty-first century, a fourth generation of critical theory scholars emerged and coalesced around Rainer Forst.

The “first generation” of critical theorists was largely occupied with the functional and conceptual re-qualification of Hegel’s dialectics. After Habermas, preference has been assigned to the understanding of the conditions of action coordination through the underpinning of the conditions of validity for speech-acts. The third generation, then, following the works of Honneth, turned back to Hegel’s philosophy and in particular to Hegel’s notion of “recognition” as a cognitive and pre-linguistic sphere grounding intersubjectivity.

Table of Contents

  1. Critical Theory: Historical and Philosophical Background
  2. What is Critical Theory?
    1. Traditional and Critical Theory: Ideology and Critique
    2. The Theory/Practice Problem
    3. The Idea of Rationality: Critical Theory and its Discontents
  3. Concluding Thoughts
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Critical Theory: Historical and Philosophical Background

Felix Weil’s father Herman made his fortune exporting grain from Argentina to Europe. In 1923 Felix convinced him to spend some of it financing an institute devoted to the study of society in the light of the Marxist tradition. At this point, Felix could not have foreseen that in the 1960s the University of Frankfurt, to which the institute was attached, would receive the epithet “Karl Marx University”. The initial idea of an independently founded institute was conceived to provide for studies on the labor movement and the origins of anti-Semitism, which at the time were being ignored in German intellectual and academic life

Not long after its inception, the Institute for Social Research was formally recognized by the Ministry of Education as an entity attached to Frankfurt University. The first official appointed director was Carl Grünberg (1923-9), a Marxist legal and political professor at the University of Vienna. His contribution to the Institute was the creation of an historical archive mainly oriented to the study of the labor movement (also known as the Grünberg Archiv).

In 1930, Max Horkheimer succeeded Grünberg. While continuing the Marxist inspiration, Horkheimer interpreted the Institute’s mission to be more directed towards an interdisciplinary integration of the social sciences. Additionally, the Grünberg Archiv ceased to publish, and instead a different official organ was launched which was to have a much greater impact: the Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung. While never officially supporting any party, the Institute entertained intensive research exchanges with the Soviet Union.

It was under Horkheimer’s leadership that members of the Institute were able to address a wide variety of economic, social, political and aesthetic topics, ranging from empirical analysis to philosophical theorization. Different interpretations of Marxism and its historical applications explain some of the hardest confrontations on economic themes within the Institute, such as the case of Pollock’s criticism of Grossman’s standard view on the pauperization of capitalism. This particular confrontation led Grossman to leave the Institute. Pollock’s critical reinterpretation of Marx also received support from intellectuals who greatly contributed to the later development of the School: for instance, Leo Lowenthal, Theodor Wiesengrund-Adorno and Erich Fromm. In particular, with Fromm’s development of a psychoanalytic trend at the Institute and with an influential philosophical contribution by Hokheimer, it became clear how under his directorship the Institute faced a drastic turning point characterizing all its future endeavors. In the following, I shall briefly introduce some of the main research patterns introduced by Fromm and Horkheimer respectively.

From the beginning, psychoanalysis in the Frankfurt School was conceived in terms of a reinterpretation of Freud and Marx. Its consideration in the School was clearly due to Horkheimer, who encouraged his researchers to direct their attention to the subject. It was Fromm, nevertheless, who best produced an advancement of the discipline; his central aim was to provide, through a synthesis of Marxism and psychoanalysis, “the missing link between ideological superstructure and socio-economic base” (Jay 1966, p. 92). There was a radical shift in the conjunction of the School’s interests and psychoanalysis with the coeval entrance of Adorno and Fromm’s departure in the late 1930s. Nevertheless, the School retained psychoanalysis, and in particular Freud’s instinct theory, as an area of interest. This can be seen in Adorno’s later paper “Social Science and Sociological Tendencies in Psychoanalysis” (1946), as well as Marcuse’s book Eros and Civilization (1955). The School’s interest in psychoanalysis was characterized by the total abandonment of Marxism as well as by a progressive interest into the relation of psychoanalysis with social change and the maintenance of Fromm’s insight into the psychic (or even psychotic) role of the family. This interest became crucial in empirical studies in 1940, which culminated in Adorno’s co-authored work The Authoritarian Personality (1950).  The goal of this work was to explore, on the basis of submission of a questionnaire, a “new anthropological type” - the authoritarian personality (Adorno et al. 1950, quoted in Jay 1996, p. 239). Such a character was found to have specific traits, such as, among others: compliance with conventional values, non-critical thinking, an absence of introspectiveness.

(As pointed out by Jay: “Perhaps some of the confusion about this question was a product of terminological ambiguity. As a number of commentators have pointed out, there is an important distinction that should be drawn between authoritarianism and totalitarianism [emphasis added]. Wilhelminian and Nazi Germany, for example, were fundamentally dissimilar in their patterns of obedience. What The Authoritarian Personality was really studying was the character type of a totalitarian rather than an authoritarian society. Thus, it should have been no surprise to learn that this new syndrome was fostered by a familial crisis in which traditional paternal authority was under fire” (Jay 1996, p. 247).)

Horkheimer’s leadership provided a very distinct methodological direction and philosophical grounding to the Institute’s research interests. Against the so-called Lebensphilosophie (philosophy of life), he criticized the fetishism of subjectivity and the lack of consideration for the materialist conditions of life. Furthermore, arguing against Cartesian and Kantian philosophy, he attempted to rejoin all dichotomies - like those between consciousness and being, theory and practice, fact and value - through the use of dialectical mediation. Differently from Hegelism or Marxism though, dialectics for Horkheimer amounted to neither a metaphysical principle nor a historical praxis; it was not intended as a methodological instrument. On the contrary, Horkheimer’s dialectics functioned as the battleground for overcoming categorical fixities and oppositions. From this descended Horkheimer’s criticism of orthodox Marxism which dichotomized the opposition between productive structures and ideological superstructure, or positivism’s naïve separation of social facts from their social interpretation.

In 1933, due to the Nazi takeover, the Institute temporarily transferred first to Geneva and then in 1935 to New York and Columbia University. Two years later Horkheimer published the ideological manifesto of the School in his  “Traditional and Critical Theory” ([1937] 1976), where some of the already anticipated topics were addressed, such as the practical and critical turn of theory. In 1938 Adorno joined the Institute after spending time at Merton College, Oxford as an “advanced student.” He was invited by Horkheimer to join the Princeton Radio Research Project together with Lazarsfeld. Gradually, Adorno assumed a preponderant intellectual role in the School, culminating in the co-publication, with Horkheimer, of one of the milestones of Critical Theory: Dialectic of Enlightenment in 1947. During this time, while Germany was under Nazi seizure, the Institute remained the only free voice publishing in German. The backlash of this choice, though, was a prolonged isolation from American academic life and intellectual debate, a situation which Adorno appealed against iconoclastically as “a message in the bottle” for the lack of a public target. According to Wiggershaus: “The Institute disorientation in the late 1930s made the balancing acts it had always had to perform, for example in relation to its academic environment, even more difficult. The seminars were virtually discussion groups for the Institute’s associates, and American students only rarely took part in them” (1995, p. 251).

Interestingly, one of the School’s major topics of study was Nazism. This led to two different approaches in the School. One was guided by Neumann, Gurland and Kirchheimer and addressed mainly legal and political issues on the basis of economic substructures. The other, guided by Horkheimer, focused on psychological irrationalism as a source of obedience and domination (see Jay 1996, p. 166).

In 1941, Horkheimer moved to Pacific Palisades, near Los Angeles. He built himself a bungalow near other German intellectuals, among whom were Bertold Brecht and Thomas Mann, and those working for the film industry or aiming at doing so (Wiggershaus 1995, p. 292). Other fellows like Marcuse, Pollock and Adorno followed shortly, whereas some remained in New York. Only Benjamin refused to leave Europe and, while attempting to cross the border between France and Spain at Port Bou, committed suicide in 1940. Some months later Arendt also crossed the border there, passing on to Adorno Benjamin’s last writing, “Theses on the Philosophy of History”.

The internal division of the School between its bases in New York and California, was accompanied by a progressive distinction of research programs led respectively by Pollock on anti-Semitism from the east coast, culminating in a four-volume work titled Studies in Anti-Semitism as well as an international conference in 1944; and a trend of studies on dialectics from the west coast led by Horkheimer and Adorno. Even during these years the latter engaged in the study of anti-semitic tendencies as several publications showed, such as The Authoritarian Personality or Studies in Prejudice. After this period, only few devoted supporters of the School remained there: Horkheimer himself, Pollock, Adorno, Lowenthal, and Weil. In 1946, however, the Institute was officially invited to rejoin Frankfurt University.

Returning to West Germany, Horkheimer presented his inaugural speech for the reopening of the institute on 14 November 1951, and one week later inaugurated the academic year as a new rector of Frankfurt University. Nevertheless what was once a lively intellectual community became a small team of a few but very busy people, with Horkheimer involved in the administration of the university and Adorno occupied with different projects and teachings. In addition, due to the maintenance of US citizenship, Adorno had to go back to California, where he earned his living from qualitative analysis research. From his side, Horkheimer attempted to attract back his former assistant Marcuse when the opportunity arose for a successor to Gadamer’s chair in Frankfurt, but neither this initiative nor further occasions were successful. Marcuse remained in the United States and was offered a full position by Brandeis University. Adorno returned to Germany in August 1953 and was soon involved again in empirical research combining quantitative and qualitative methods in the analysis of industrial relations for the Mannesmann Company. Then in 1955, he took over Horkheimer’s position as director of the Institute for Social Research, and on 1 July 1957 he was appointed full professor in philosophy and sociology. Adorno’s most innovative contribution was thought to be in the field of music theory and aesthetics, where some of his significant works included Philosophy of Modern Music (1949) and later “Vers une Musique Informelle”. In 1956 Horkheimer retired just as several important publications emerged, such as Marcuse’s Eros and Civilization and the essay collection Sociologica. These events gave character to the precise research phase reached by the “Frankfurt School” and “Critical Theory”.

The sixties – which saw famous student protests across Europe – also saw the publication of Adorno’s fundamental work, Negative Dialectics (1966). While far from being conceived either in terms of materialism or of metaphysics, this maintained important connections with an “open and non systemic” notion of dialectics. Marcuse had just published One-Dimensional Man (1964), introducing the notion of “educational dictatorship”, which implied that for the sake of liberation there was a need for the advancement of material conditions for the realization of a higher notion of “the good”. While Marcuse quite ostensibly sponsored the student upheavals, Adorno maintained a much more moderate and critical profile.

In 1956, Habermas joined the Institute as Adorno’s assistant, and was soon involved in an empirical and cooperative study under the title of Students and Politics. The text, though, was rejected by Horkheimer and did not come out, as it should have, in the series Frankfurt Contributions to Sociology, but only later in 1961 in the series Sociological Texts, by the publisher Luchterhand (see Wiggershaus 1995, p. 555). Horkheimer’s aversion towards Habermas was even more evident when he was refused supervision on his habilitation. In the event, Habermas undertook his habilitation, on the topic of the bourgeois’ public sphere, under the supervision of Abendroth at Marburg. As a result of his previous studies, in 1962 Habermas published The Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere, and in the same year, just before his habilitation and thanks to Gadamer, he was appointed as professor at Heidelberg. Besides his academic achievements, as an activist the young Habermas contributed towards a critical self-awareness of the socialist student groups around the country (the so-called SDS, Sozialistischer Deutscher Studentenbund). It was in this context that Habermas had to deal with the extremism of Rudi Dutschke, the students’ radical leader who criticized him for defending a non-effective emancipatory view. Discussion of the notion of “emancipation” has been at the center of the Frankfurt School’s political contention and of its philosophical debates. For the sake of clarification, it must be said that the German word “Befreiung”, covers a much wider semantic spectrum than “emancipation;” its most recurrent use in German philosophical works is that of “liberation”, which implies either a transformative or even a revolutionary action. Due to the plasticity of “Befreiung”, Critical Theory scholars engaged into a far reaching process of conceptual and political clarification; accordingly, it was principally against Dutschke’s positions that Habermas, during a public assembly, labeled such positions with the epitome “left-wing fascism”. How representative this expression is of Habermas’ views on students’ protests has often been a matter of contention, even though this reaction cannot be taken to encompass the complexity of the Habermasian position respect to the students’ liberation movement.

After his nomination in 1971 as a director of the Max Planck Institut for Research into the Conditions of Life in the Scientific-Technical World at Starnberg, Habermas left Frankfurt, returning there in 1981 after the completion of one of his masterpieces, The Theory of Communicative Action. This decade was crucial for the definition of the School’s research objectives as well as most of the fundamental research achievements of the so-called “second generation” of Frankfurt scholars. In his two-volume work The Theory of Communicative Action (1984b [1981]), Habermas provided a model of social complexities and action coordination based upon the original interpretation of classical social theorists as well as contemporary philosophy of language such as Searle’s Speech Acts theory. Within this work, it also became evident how the large amount of empirical work conducted by Habermas’ research team on topics concerning pathologies of society, moral development and so on, was elevated to a functionalistic model of society oriented to an emancipatory purpose. This normative force can be detected from within language itself, in what Habermas defined as the “unavoidable pragmatic presuppositions of mutual understanding”. Social action, therefore, whose coordination function relies on the same pragmatic presuppositions, gets connected to a justification for the validity of claims.

Habermas describes discourse theory as characterized by three types of validity-claims raised by communicative acts: it is only when the conditions of truth, rightness and sincerity are raised by speech-acts that social coordination is obtained. In contrast to the closeness of the German intellectual world characterizing most of the first generation of Frankfurt scholars, Habermas contributed greatly to bridge the continental and analytical traditions, integrating prospects belonging to American Pragmatism, Anthropology and Semiotics with Marxism and Critical Social Theory.

Just one year before Habermas’ retirement in 1994, the directorship of the Institut für Sozialforschung was assumed by Honneth. This inaugurated a new phase of Critical Theory, both in terms of generation (the third generation) and in terms of philosophical research as Honneth revived the Hegelian notion of recognition (Anerkennung) in social and political enquiry. Honneth began his collaboration with Habermas in 1984, when he was hired as assistant professor. After a period of academic appointments in Berlin and Konstanz, in 1996 he took Habermas’ chair in Frankfurt.

Honneth’s central tenet, the struggle for recognition, represents a leitmotiv finding wide discussion in The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts ([1986]), certainly one of Honneth’s greatest texts. This work is a mature expansion of what was partially addressed in his dissertation, a work published under the title of Critique of Power: Stages of Reflection of a Critical Social Theory (1991 [1985]). One of the core themes addressed by Honneth is that, contrary to what Critical Theory had emphasized so far, more attention should be paid to the notion of conflict in society and among societal groups. Such conflict represents the internal movement of historical advancement and human emancipation, falling therefore within the core theme of critical social theory. The so-called “struggle for recognition” is what best characterizes the fight for emancipation by social groups, and this fight represents a subjective negative experience of domination – a form of domination attached to misrecognitions. To come to terms with such negations of subjective forms of self-realization means to be able to transform social reality. Normatively, though, acts of social struggle activated by forms of misrecognition point to the role that recognition plays as a crucial criterion for grounding intersubjectivity.

Honneth inaugurated a new research phase in Critical Theory. Indeed, his communitarian turn of social theory has been paralleled by the work of some of his fellow scholars. Brunkhorst, for instance, in his Solidarity: From Civic Friendship to a Global Legal Community (2005 [2002]), canvasses a line of thought springing from the French Revolution of 1789 to contemporary times, which has been still insufficiently explored so far: the notion of fraternity. By the use of historical conceptual reconstruction and normative speculation, Brunkhorst presents the pathologies of the contemporary globalized world and the function that “solidarity” would play.

The confrontation with American debate initiated systematically by the work of Habermas has become then normal practice during the third generation of critical social theorists. Additionally since Habermas, the third generation has engaged in dialogue with French post-modern philosophers like Derrida, Baudrillard, Lyotard, and so forth, which according to Foucault are legitimate interpreters of some central instances of the Frankfurt School.

2. What is Critical Theory?

“What is ‘theory’?” asks Horkheimer in the opening of his essay Traditional and Critical Theory [1937]. The discussion about method, has been always a constant topic for those critical theorists who, since the beginning, have attempted to clarify the specificity of what it means for social theory to be “critical”. A primary broad distinction that Horkheimer drew was that of the difference in method between social theories, scientific theories and critical social theories. While the first two categories have been treated as instances of traditional theories, the latter connoted the methodology the Frankfurt School adopted.

Traditional theory, whether deductive or analytical, has always focused on coherency and on the strict distinction between theory and praxis. Along Cartesian lines, knowledge was treated as being grounded upon self-evident propositions, or at least upon propositions derivable from self-evident truths. Traditional theory proceeded to explain facts through the application of universal laws, so that by the subsumption of a particular into the universal, law was either confirmed or disconfirmed. A verificationist procedure of this kind was what positivism has considered to be the best explicatory account for the notion of praxis in scientific investigation. If one were to defend the view according to which scientific truths, in order to be considered so, should pass the test of empirical confirmation, then he would commit himself to the idea of an objective world. Knowledge would be simply a mirror of reality. This point is firmly refused by Critical Theory.

Under several aspects, what Critical Theory wants to reject in traditional theory is precisely this “picture theory” of language and knowledge widely presented originally in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus. According to such view, later abandoned by Wittgenstein himself, the logical form of propositions consists in “showing” a possible fact and in “saying” whether this is true or false. For example, the proposition “it rains today”, shows both the possibility of the fact that “it rains today”, and says that it is actually the case that “it rains today.” In order to check whether something is or is not the case, I have to verify empirically whether it occurs or not. This implies that the condition of truth and falsehood presupposes an objective structure of the world.

Horkheimer and his followers rejected the notion of objectivity in knowledge by pointing, among other things, to the fact that the object of knowledge is itself embedded into an historical and social process: “The facts which our sense present to us are socially preformed in two ways: through the historical character of the object perceived and through the historical character of the perceiving organ” (Horkheimer [1937] in Ingram and Simon-Ingram 1992, p. 242). Further, with a rather Marxian tone, Horkheimer noticed also that phenomenical objectivity is a myth because it is dependent upon “technological conditions” and that the latter is sensitive of the material conditions of production. Critical Theory thus wants to abandon naïve conceptions of knowledge-impartiality. Since intellectuals themselves are not disembodied entities reflecting from outside, knowledge can be obtained only from within a society of interdependent individuals.

If traditional theory is evaluated in accordance with its practical implications, then no practical consequences can be inferred. As a matter of fact, the finality of knowledge as a mirror of reality is mainly theoretically oriented and aimed at separating knowledge from action, speculation from social transformative enterprise. On the contrary, Critical Theory characterizes itself as a method which does not “fetishize” knowledge, considering it rather functional to ideology critique and social emancipation. In the light of such finalities, knowledge becomes social criticism, and the latter translates itself into social action, that is, into the transformation of reality.

Critical Theory has been strongly influenced by Hegel’s notion of dialectics, the latter aimed at reconciling socio-historical oppositions, as well as by Marx’s theory of economy and society and the limits of Hegel’s “bourgeois philosophy”. Critical Theory, indeed, has expanded Marxian criticisms of capitalist society, by formulating patterns of social emancipatory strategies. Whereas Hegel found that Rationality had finally come to terms with Reality through the birth of the modern national state (which in his eyes was the Prussian state), Marx insisted on the necessity of reading the development of rationality through history as a struggle of social classes. The final stage of this struggle would have seen the political and economic empowerment of the proletariat. Critical theorists, in their turn, rejected both the metaphysical apparatus of Hegel and the eschatological aspects connected to Marx’s theory. On the contrary, Critical Theory analyses, oriented to the understanding of society, pointed rather to the necessity of establishing open systems of analysis based on an immanent form of social criticism. Their starting point was the Marxian view on the relation between a system of production paralleled by a system of beliefs. Ideology, which according to Marx, was totally explicable through the underlying system of production, had, for critical theorists, to be analyzed in its own respect and as a non-economically reducible form of expression of human rationality. Such a revision of Marxian categories became extremely crucial, then, in the reinterpretation of the notion of dialectic for the analysis of capitalism. In the light of this, dialectic, as a method of social criticism, was interpreted as following from the contradictory nature of capitalism as a system of exploitation. Indeed, it was on the basis of such inherent contradictions that capitalism was seen to open up to a collective form of ownership of the means of production, that is, socialism.

a. Traditional and Critical Theory: Ideology and Critique

From these conceptually rich implications one can observe some of the constant topics which have characterized critical social theory – that is, the normativity of social philosophy as something distinct from classical descriptive sociology, the everlasting crux on the theory/practice relation, or even ideology criticism. These are the primary tasks that a critical social theory must accomplish in order to be defined as “critical.” Crucial in this sense is the understanding and the criticism of the notion of “ideology”.

In defining the senses to be assigned to the notion of ideology, within its descriptive-empirical sense “one might study the biological and quasi-biological properties of the group” or, alternatively, “the cultural or socio-cultural features of the group” (Geuss 1981, p. 4 ff). Ideology, in the descriptive sense, incorporates both “discursive” and “non-discursive” elements. That is, in addition to propositional contents or performatives, it includes gestures, ceremonies, and so forth (Geuss 1981, pp. 6-8); also, it shows a systematic set of beliefs - a world-view - characterized by conceptual schemes. A variant of the descriptive sense is the “pejorative” version, where a form of ideology is judged negatively in view of its epistemic, functional or genetic properties (Geuss 1981, p. 13).  On the other hand, if one takes “ideology” according to a positive sense, then, he is not dealing with something empirically given, but rather with a “desideratum”, a “verité a faire” (Geuss 1981, p. 23). Critical Theory, though, distinguishes itself from scientific theories tout court, since while the latter produce a sort of objectified knowledge, the former serves the purpose of human emancipation through consciousness and self-reflection.

If the task of critical social theory is that of evaluating the rationality of any system of social domination in view of certain standards of justice, then ideological criticism has the function of unmasking wrong rationalizations of present or past injustices – that is, ideology in the factual and negative sense - such as in the case of the belief that “women are inferior to men, or blacks to whites…”. Thus ideological criticism has the function of proposing alternative practicable ways for constructing the social bound. Critical Theory moves precisely in between the contingency of objectified non-critical factual reality and the normativity of utopian idealizations, that is, within the so-called “theory/practice” problem (see Ingram 1990, p. xxiii). Marcuse, for instance, in the essay Philosophie und kritische Theorie (1937), defends the view that Critical Theory characterizes itself as being neither philosophy tout court, nor pure science as overly simplistic Marxism claims. Critical Theory has easier tasks: that of clarifying the sociopolitical determinants explaining the limits of analysis of a certain philosophical view, as well as that of transcending the use of imagination - the actual limits of imagination. From all this, two notions of “rationality” result: the first attached to the dominant form of power and deprived of any normative force; the second characterized, on the contrary, by a liberating force based on a yet-to-come scenario. This difference in forms of rationality is what Habermas later presented, mutatis mutandis, as the distinction between “instrumental” and “communicative” rationality. While the first is oriented to a means-ends understanding of human and environmental relations, the second is oriented to subordinating human action to the respect of certain normative criteria of action validity. This latter point echoes quite distinctively Kant’s principle of morality according to which human beings must be always treated as “ends in themselves” and never as mere “means”. Critical Theory, and Habermas in particular, are no exception towards such a double layer of rationality, since they both see Ideologiekritik not just as a form of “moralizing criticism”, but as a form of knowledge, that is as a cognitive operation for disclosing the falsity of conscience (Geuss 1981, p. 26).

This point is strictly connected to another conceptual category playing a great role within Critical Theory, the concept of “interest” and in particular the distinction between “true interests” and “false interests”. As Geuss suggests, there are two possible ways to make such a separation: “the perfect-knowledge approach” and “the optimal conditions approach” (1981, p. 48). Were one to follow the first option, the outcome would be that of falling into the side of acritical utopianism. On the contrary, “the optimal conditions approach” is reinterpreted, at least in Habermas, in terms of an “ideal speech situation” which, by virtually granting an all-encompassing exchange of arguments, assumes the function of providing a counterfactual normative check on actual discursive contexts. Within such a model, therefore, epistemic knowledge and social critical reflection are attached to unavoidable pragmatic-transcendental conditions that are universally the same for all.

The universality of such epistemological status differs profoundly from Adorno’s contextualism where individual epistemic principles grounding cultural criticism and self-reflection are recognized to be legitimately different in accordance to time and history. Both versions are “critical” in that they remain faithful to the objective of clearing false consciousness from ignorance and domination; but whereas Habermas sets a high standard of validity/non-validity for discourse theory, Adorno’s historicism is oriented towards “degrees” of rationality that are variable according to contexts. In one of his late 1969 writings  (republished in Adorno 2003, pp. 292 ff.), Adorno provides a short but dense interpretation in the form of eight theses on the significance and the mission of Critical Theory. The central message is that Critical Theory while drawing from Marxism, must avoid hypostatization and closure into a single Weltanschauung on the pain of losing its “critical” capacity. By interpreting rationality as a form of self-reflective activity, Critical Theory represents a particular form of rational enquiry capable of distinguishing, immanently, “ideology” from Hegelian “Spirit”. The mission of Critical Theory, though, is not exhausted by a theoretical understanding of the social reality; as a matter of fact, there is a strict interconnection between critical understanding and transformative action: theory and practice are interconnected.

b. The Theory/Practice Problem

During the course of its history, Critical Theory has always confronted itself with one crucial methodological problem: the “theory/practice” problem. To this issue critical theorists have provided different answers, so that it is not possible to organize a homogeneous set of views. In order to understand what the significance of the theory/practice problem is, one must refer back to David Hume’s “is/ought” question. What Hume demonstrated through the separation of the “is” from the “ought” was the non-derivability of prescriptive statements from descriptive ones. This separation has been at the basis of those ethical theories that have not recognized moral statements as a truth-property. In other words, according to the reading provided to the “is/ought” relation, it follows that either a cognitivist approach (truth-validity of moral statements), or a non-cognitivist approach is defended (no truth-validity), as in the case of the thesis according to which moral statements simply “express” an attitude (expressivism).

Even if characterized by several internal differences, what Critical Theory added to this debate was the consideration both of the anthropological as well as the psychological dynamics motivating masses and structuring ideologies.

As far as the anthropological determinants in closing up the gap of the “theory/practice” problem is concerned, one can consider Habermas’ Knowledge and Human Interest ([1968] 1971). There Habermas combines a transcendental argument with an anthropological one by defending the view according to which humans have an interest in knowledge insofar as such interest is attached to the preservation of self-identity. Yet, to preserve one’s identity is to go beyond mere compliance with biological survival, as Habermas clarifies: “[…] human interests […] derive both from nature and from the cultural break with nature” (Habermas [1968], in Ingram and Simon-Ingram,1992, p. 263). On the contrary, to preserve one’s identity means to see, in the emancipatory force of knowledge, the fundamental interest of human beings. Indeed, the grounding of knowledge into the practical domain has quite far-reaching implications, as for instance that interest and knowledge, in Habermas, find their unity in self-reflection, that is, in “knowledge for the sake of knowledge” (Habermas [1968], in Ingram and Simon-Ingram 1992, p. 264).

The Habermasian answer to the theory/practice problem comes from his criticism of non-cognitivist theories. If it is true, as non-cognitivists claim, that prescriptive claims are grounded on commands and do not have any cognitive content which can be justified through an exchange of public arguments, it follows that they cannot provide an answer to the difference between what is a “convergent behavior”, established through normative power on the basis, for example, of punishment, and what is instead “following a valid rule”. In the latter case, there seems to be required an extra layer of justification, namely, a process through which a norm can be defined as “valid”. Such process is for Habermas conceived in terms of a counterfactual procedure for a discursive exchange of arguments. This procedure is aimed at justifying those “generalizable interests” that ought to be obeyed because they pass the test of moral validity.

The Habermasian answer to the “is/ought” question has several important implications. One, and maybe the most important, is the criticism of positivism and of the epistemic status of knowledge. On the basis of Habermasian premises, indeed, there can be no objective knowledge, as positivists claim, detached from intersubjective forms of understanding. Since knowledge is strictly embedded in serving human interests, it follows that it cannot be considered value-neutral and objectively independent.

A further line of reflection on the “theory/practice” problem comes from psychoanalysis. In such cases, the outcomes have maintained a strict separation between the “is” and “ought”, and of unmasked false “oughts” through the clarification of the psychological mechanisms constructing desires. Accordingly, critical theorists like Fromm referred to Freud’s notions of the unconscious which contributed defining ideologies in terms of “substitute gratifications”. Psychoanalysis represented such a strong component within the research of the Frankfurt School that even Adorno in his article Freudian Theory and the Pattern of Fascist Propaganda (1951) analyzed Fromm’s interconnection between sadomasochism and fascism. Adorno noticed how a parallel can be drawn between the loss of self-confidence and estimation in hierarchical domination and a compensation through self-confidence which can be re-obtained in active forms of dominations. Such mechanisms of sadomasochism, though, are not only proper of fascism. As Adorno noticed, they reappear under different clothes in modern cultural industry through the consumption of so-called “cultural commodities”.

Notwithstanding the previous discussions, the greatest philosophical role of psychoanalysis within Frankfurt School was exemplified by Marcuse’s thought. In his case, the central problem became that of interpreting the interest genealogy at the basis of capitalist ideology. But how can one provide an account of class interests after the collapse of classes? How can one formulate, on the basis of the insight provided by psychoanalysis, the criteria through which it can distinguish true from false interests? The way adopted by Marcuse was with a revisitation of Freud’s theory of instinctual needs. Differently from Freud’s tensions between nature and culture and Fromm’s total social shaping of natural instincts, Marcuse defended a third – median – perspective where instincts were considered only partially shaped by social relations (Ingram 1990, p. 93 ff). Through such a solution, Marcuse overcame the strict opposition between biological and historical rationality preventing the resolution of the theory/practice problem. He did so by recalling the annihilation of individual’s sexual energy at the basis of organized society, recalling in its turn the archetypical scenario of a total fulfillment of pleasure. Imagination is taken by Marcuse as a way to obtain individual reconciliation with social reality, a reconciliation, though, which hid his underlying unresolved tension. Marcuse conceived of overcoming such tensions through the aestheticization of basic instincts liberated through the work of imagination. The problem with Marcuse’s rationalization of basic instincts was that by relying excessively on human biology it became impossible to distinguish between the truth or falsity of socially dependent needs (see on this Ingram 1990, p. 103).

c. The Idea of Rationality: Critical Theory and its Discontents

For Critical Theory, rationality has always been a crucial theme in the analysis of modern society as well as of its pathologies. Whereas the early Frankfurt School and Habermas viewed rationality as a historical process whose unity was taken as a precondition for social criticism, later critical philosophies influenced mainly by post-modernity privileged a rather more fragmented notion of (ir)rationality manifested by social institutions. In the latter, social criticism did not represent a self-reflective form of rationality since rationality was not conceived as an incorporated process of history. One point shared by all critical theorists was that forms of social pathology were connected to deficits of rationality, which in their turn manifested interconnections with the psychological status of the mind (see Honneth 2004, p. 339 ff.).

In non-pathological social aggregations, individuals should be capable of achieving cooperative forms of self-actualizations only if freed from coercive mechanisms of domination. Accordingly, for the Frankfurt School, modern processes of bureaucratic administration exemplified what Weber had already considered as an all-encompassing domination of formal rationality over substantive values. In Weber, rationality is to be interpreted as “purposive rationality”, that is, as a form of instrumental reason. Accordingly, the use of reason does not amount to formulating prescriptive models of society but aims at achieving goals through the selection of the best possible means of action. If in Lukács the proletariat was to represent the only dialectical way out from the total control of formal rationality, Horkheimer and Adorno saw technological domination of human action as the negation of the inspiring purposes of Enlightenment. In their most important work - Dialectic of Enlightenment (1969 [1947]) – they emphasized the role of knowledge and technology as a “means of exploitation” of labor, and viewed the dialectic of reason as the archetypical movement of human self-liberation. Nevertheless, the repression by formal-instrumental rationality of natural chaos has had as a consequence that of determining a resurgence of natural violence under a different form, so that the liberation from nature through instrumental reason has led to domination by a totalitarian state (see Ingram 1990, p. 63).

According to this view, reason is essentially a form of control over nature which has characterized humanity since its beginning, that is, since those attempts aimed at providing a mythological explanation of cosmic forces. The purpose served by such instrumental rationality was essentially that of promoting self-preservation, even if this paradoxically turned into the fragmentation of bourgeois individuality which, once deprived of any substantive value, became merely formal and thus determined by external influences of “mass-identity” in a context of “cultural industry”.

Rationality thus began to assume a double significance: on the one hand, as traditionally recognized by German idealism, it was conceived as the primary source of human emancipation; on the other, it was conceived as the premise of totalitarianism. If, as Weber believed, modern rationalization of society came to a formal reduction of the power of rationality, it followed that hyper-bureaucratization of society led not just to a complete separation between facts and values, but also to a total disinterest in the latter. Nevertheless, for Critical Theory it remained essential to defend the validity of social criticism on the basis of the idea that humanity is embedded in a historical learning process, where clash is due to the actualization of reason re-establishing a power balance and to struggles for group domination.

Given such general framework on rationality, it can be said that Critical Theory today has undergone several “internal” and “external” reformulations and criticisms. First of all, Habermas himself has suggested a further “pre-linguistic” line of enquiry making appeal to the notion of “authenticity” and “imagination”, so to suggest a radical reformulation of the same notion of “truth” and “reason” in the light of its metaphorical capacities of signification (see Habermas 1984a). Secondly, the commitment of Critical Theory to universal validity and universal pragmatics has been widely criticized by post-structuralists and post-modernists who have instead insisted respectively on the hyper-contextualism of the forms of linguistic rationality, as well as on the substitution of a criticism of ideology with genealogical criticism. While Derrida’s “deconstructive method” has shown how binary opposition collapses when applied to the semantic level, so that meaning can only be contextually constructed, Foucault oriented his criticisms to the supposedly “emancipatory” power of universal reason by showing how forms of domination permeate micro-levels of power-control such as in sanatoriums, educational and religious bodies and so on. The control of life - known as bio-power - manifests itself in the attempt of “normalizing” and constraining individuals’ behaviors and psychic lives. For Foucault, reason is embedded into such practices which display in their turn the multiple layers of force. The activity of the analyst in this sense is not far from the same activity of the participant: there is no objective perspective which can be defended. Derrida, for instance, while pointing to the Habermasian idea of pragmatic communication, still avoids any overlapping by defending the thesis of a restless deconstructive potential of any constructing activity, so that no unavoidable pragmatic presuppositions nor idealizing conditions of communication can survive deconstruction. On the other hand, Habermasian “theory of communicative action and discourse ethics”, while remaining sensitive to contexts, defends transcendental conditions of discourse which, if violated, lead to performative contradiction. To the Habermasian role of “consensus” or “agreement” in discursive models, Foucault objected that rather than a “regulatory” principle, a true “critical” approach would simply command against “nonconsensuality” (see Rabinow, ed. 1984, p. 379 ff).

3. Concluding Thoughts

The debate between Foucault and Critical Theory – and in particular Habermas – is quite illuminating of the common “critical” purposes versus the diverging methodologies defended by the two approaches. For Foucault it is not correct to propose a second-order theory for defining what rationality is. Rationality is not to be found in abstract forms. On the contrary, what social criticism can achieve is the uncovering of deeply enmeshed forms of irrationality deposited in contingent and historical institution-embeddings. Genealogical method, though, does not reject that (ir)-rationality is part of history; on the contrary, rather than suggesting abstract and procedural rational models, it dissects concrete institutional social practices through “immanent criticism”. To this, Habermas has easily objected that any activity of rational criticism “presupposes” unavoidable conditions for its same exercise. This relaunches the necessity of formulating transcendental conditions for immanent criticism revealed along the same pragmatic conditions of criticism itself. For Habermas, criticism is possible only if universal standards of validity are recognized and only if understanding (Verständigung) and agreement (Einverständnis) are seen as interconnected practices.

A further line of criticism against Habermas, which embraces more widely Critical Theory as such, comes from scholars like Chantal Mouffe (2005) who have detected in the notion of “consensus” a surrender from engagement into “political agonism”. If, as Mouffe claims, the model of discursive action is bound to the achievement of consensus, then, what role would be reserved to politics after such an agreement has been obtained? The charge of eliminating the consideration of “political action” from “the political” has been extended, retrospectively, also to previous critical theorists such as Horkheimer, Adorno and Marcuse by the so-called third generation of critical theorists. The criticism concerns the non-availability of a context-specific political guidance answering the question “What is to be done?” (see Chambers 2004, p. 219 ff.) Whereas Critical Theory aims at fostering human emancipation, it remains incapable of specifying a political action-strategy for social change. A clear indication in this sense came, for instance, from Marcuse’s idea of “the Great Refusal”, which predicated abstention from full engagement and transformative attempts directed towards capitalist economy and democratic institutions (Marcuse 1964). It is indeed towards such a widespread trend that the third generation of critical theorists with Honneth, Fraser and Benhabib, among others, engaged in a philosophical dialogue integrating such lacunae. Honneth revisited the Hegelian notion of “(mis)-recognition” by enriching both its normative content, social significance and psychological force; Fraser insisted, instead, on the notion of “redistribution” as a key element for overcoming economic inequalities and power-imbalances in post-industrial societies where cultural affiliations are no more significant sources of power. Finally, Benhabib contributed to the clarification of the “universalist” trend by clarifying the significance of the Habermasian “dual-track” model, through the distinction between “moral” issues (universalism) proper of the institutional level and the “ethical” issues (pluralism) characterizing, instead, informal public deliberations. Benhabib’s views, by making explicit several Habermasian assumptions, seem to be able to countervail both the post-structuralist and the post-modern charge to Critical Theory’s absence of engagement into political action. Whereas the requirement of universalist “consensus” pertains only to the institutional sphere, the ethical domain is instead characterized by a plurality of views confronting each other within systems of life.

As introduced at the beginning, one can speak now of a “fourth” generation of Critical Theory scholars revolving mainly around the figure of Rainer Forst. Like that of his doctoral supervisor Jürgen Habermas, Forst’s philosophical preoccupation has been that of addressing the American political debate with the specific aim of constructing a third alternative paradigm to that of liberalism and communitarianism. Contrary to what might superficially appear at a first glance, Forst’s attempt has never been that of replacing “obsolete” Critical Theory arguments with contemporary analytic theories. On the contrary, he has often attempted at “integrating” and “bridging” analytic and continental traditions. These efforts are clearly visible also from one of Forst’s latest essays devoted to the normative justification of human rights (Forst, [2010] 2011). There the author refers to the “right to justification” as the grounding principle for the universal ascription of human rights. What is worth noticing is that the principle of the “right to justification” provokes echoes both across the analytic and the Critical Theory domain. It seems therefore that the new challenge Critical Theory is today facing consists precisely in detecting key concepts at the crossroads of both the Anglo-Saxon and the Continental tradition.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, Theodor W. et al. The Authoritarian Personality, New York: Harper and Brothers, 1950.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. Eine Bildmonographie, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 2003.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. “Freudian Theory and the Pattern of Fascist Propaganda” (1951), in Andrew Arato and Eike Gebhardt (eds.). The Essential Frankfurt School Reader, Continuum: New York, 1982.
  • Brunkhorst, Hauke. Solidarity: From Civic Friendship to a Global Legal Community, trans. by J. Flynn, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, (2002) 2005.
  • Chambers, Simone. “The Politics of Critical Theory”, in Fred Rush Fred (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Couzens, David and Thomas McCarthy. Critical Theory. Oxford: Blackwell, 1994.
  • Forst, Rainer, “The Justification of Human Rights and the Basic Right to Justification. A Reflexive Approach”, Ethics 120:4 (2010), 711-40, reprinted in Claudio Corradetti (ed.). Philosophical Dimensions of Human Rights. Some Contemporary Views, Springer: Dordrecht, 2011.
  • Geuss, Raymond. The Idea of a Critical Theory. Habermas & the Frankfurt School, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Knowledge and Human Interests. Boston: Beacon Press, (1968) 1971.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. “Questions and Counter-Questions”, Praxis International 4:3 (1984a).
  • Habermas, Jürgen. The Theory of Communicative Action, vols. 1 and 2, Boston: Beacon Press, (1981) 1984b.
  • Honneth, Axel. Critique of Power: Reflective Stages in a Critical Social Theory, trans. by Kenneth Baynes. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press,  [1985] 1991.
  • Honneth, Axel. The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts, trans. by Joel Anderson. Cambridge: Polity Press, [1986] 1995.
  • Honneth, Axel. “The Intellectual legacy of Critical Theory”, in Fred Rush (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Horkheimer, Max. “Traditional and Critical Theory”, in Paul Connerton (ed.). Critical Sociology: Selected Readings, Harmondsworth: Penguin, [1937] 1976.
  • Horkheimer, Max and Theodor W. Adorno. Dialectic of Enlightenment, New York: Continuum, [1947] 1969.
  • Ingram, David. Critical Theory and Philosophy, St. Paul: Paragon House, 1990.
  • Ingram, David and Julia Simon-Ingram. Critical Theory: the Essential Readings, St. Paul: Paragon House, 1992.
  • Jay, Martin. The Dialectical Imagination, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996.
  • Lukács, Georg. History and Class Consciousness, Cambridge Mass.: MIT Press, [1968], 1971.
  • Marcuse, Herbert. “Philosophie und Kritische Theorie”, Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung VI:3 (1937).
  • Marcuse, Herbert. One Dimensional Man: Studies in the Ideology of Advanced Industrial Society, Boston: Beacon Press, 1964.
  • Mouffe, Chantal. The Democratic Paradox, London: Verso, 2005.
  • Rabinow, Paul (ed.). “Politics and Ethics: an Interview”, in The Foucault Reader, New York: Pantheon, 1984.
  • Rush, Fred. Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Wiggershaus, Rolf. The Frankfurt School, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1995.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, London: Routledge, 2001 [1st English edition 1922].

Author Information

Claudio Corradetti
European Academy and the University of Rome

Michel Foucault: Ethics

The French philosopher and historian Michel Foucault (1926-1984) does not understand ethics as moral philosophy, the metaphysical and epistemological investigation of ethical concepts (metaethics) and the investigation of the criteria for evaluating actions (normative ethics), as Anglo-American philosophers do.  Instead, he defines ethics as a relation of self to itself in terms of its moral agency.  More specifically, ethics denotes the intentional work of an individual on itself in order to subject itself to a set of moral recommendations for conduct and, as a result of this self-forming activity or “subjectivation,” constitute its own moral being.

The classical works of Foucault’s ethics are his historical studies of ancient sexual ethics in The Use of Pleasure and The Care of the Self, in addition to the late interviews “On the Genealogy of Ethics” and “The Ethics for the Concern of Self as a Practice of Freedom.”  The publication of his final three lecture courses at the Collège de France in 1982-3 considerably enhance how those texts are to be understood and provide original resources.  The Hermeneutics of the Subject provides greater insight into the ancient ethics of caring for self and how Foucault perceives it in relation to the history of philosophy.  Both The Government of Self and Others and The Courage of Truth – his final courses, respectively – make it manifest that he considered the ancient ethical practice of parrhesia or frank-speech central to ancient ethics and, indeed, important to his own philosophical practice.

The significance of this so-called ‘ethical turn’ for Foucault’s philosophy is displayed in the controversial terms through which he ultimately expressed the purpose of his work.  He lays claim to the spirit of the tradition of critical philosophy established by Immanuel Kant, and Foucault purports to exemplify this spirit by disclosing, or telling the truth about, the historical conditions of the contingent constraints that we impose on ourselves and, in doing so, opening possibilities for autonomous ethical relations.  Foucault’s claim to the spirit of critical philosophy has received, and continues to receive, criticism and considerable discussion in the scholarly literature.  Of central concern are the compatibility of his claim to critical philosophy as an ethical practice and his broader views about subjectivity, and whether his critical analysis of modern ethics is meant to be merely descriptive or also evaluative.

The primary focus of this article is the nature of ethics as Foucault conceives it, and it is unpacked by discussion of his published historical studies of ancient Greek and Roman ethics.  The article then considers his treatment of the ancient ethical injunction of the care of the self and parrhesia, transitioning into a presentation of, and opinions about, his alleged ethical turn and the contentious role that ethics might play in his critical philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. The ‘Ethical Turn’
  2. Morality and Ethics
  3. The Elements of Ethical Relations
    1. The Ethical Substance (Ontology)
    2. Mode of Subjection (Deontology)
    3. Ethical Work (Ascetics)
    4. Telos (Teleology)
  4. The Care of the Self
    1. Caring for Oneself and Knowing Oneself
    2. Parrhesia (Frank-Speech)
  5. Ethics and Critical Philosophy
    1. Kant and Foucault
    2. Critique and Parrhesia
    3. Parrhesia and Self-Legislation
    4. The Problem of Normativity and the Aesthetics of Existence
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources and Abbreviations
    2. Select Secondary Sources

1. The ‘Ethical Turn’

As important as ethics becomes in Foucault’s later thought, prior to 1981 he rarely touches on themes directly related to either ethics or morality.  One rare, short, but not unimportant analysis occurs in The Order of Things.  There, Foucault maintains that modern ethical thought attempts to derive moral obligations from human nature and yet modern thought also holds that human nature can never be, given the fact of human finitude, fully given to human knowledge.  Consequently, modern thought is incapable of coherently formulating a set of moral obligations (OT 326-7; see also PPC 49).  This argument is, essentially, one piece of his larger attack on modern humanism and its conception of the human being as subject, a being that supplies for itself the foundations of knowledge, value, and freedom.  Discipline and Punish and the first volume of The History of Sexuality further this line of criticism, insisting on the historical constitution of the subject by discursive practices and techniques of power (see, for example, FL 67, PK 117, EW3 3-4, DP 30).  In short, his writings through the 1970’s comprise a multifaceted attack on the modern notion of self-constitution.

It is surprising to many commentators, then, that by 1982 Foucault elaborated a framework for his work that grants self-constitution considerable importance.  He explains his “history of thought” as a history of “focal points of experience,” the persistently occurring ways in which humans conceive and perceive themselves – as mad, diseased, sexual, and so forth.  These focal points are studied along three axes:  the axis of knowledge, or the rules of discursive practices that determine what counts as true or false; the axis of power, or the rationalities and techniques by which one governs the conduct of others; and the axis of ethics, or the practices of self through which an individual constitutes itself as a subject (GSO 1-5).  Richard Bernstein aptly characterizes the scholarly reaction to Foucault’s introduction of ethics when the former states the ethical thematic seems to presume the concept of a self-constituting subject that latter’s earlier work sought to criticize (Bernstein 1994; see also Milchman and Rosenberg 2007).

Foucault never did articulate a clear position on the conceptual fit between his critique of the modern subject and his account of ethics.  Nevertheless, he does provide some clues as to the nature of his mature position.  Late in his life he admits that his earlier work was too insistent on the formation of subjectivity by discursive practices and power-relations (EW1 177, 225).  Now, his focus is on the subject as both constituted and self-constituting, or the point at which discursive practices and power-relations dovetail with ethics.  Of course, this does not decisively resolve the problem, but it does suggest a rereading of his earlier works more conducive to the notion of self-constitution.  In fact, in later writings and interviews Foucault supports this interpretation when he explains that all the axes of analysis existed in a confused manner (EW1 262); he even retrospectively interprets his work as fitting one or more of those axes (EW1 202-5).  By admitting that, first, all three axes of analysis existed in earlier works, and, second, that the goal of his work is to study the connection of knowledge and power with ethics, Foucault suggests that there is no ethical turn.  Of course, this does not license the commentator to avoid the potentially problematic conceptual fit between Foucault’s mature conception of subjectivity and his earlier critique of the self-constituting subject.  However, it does appear to be the case that Foucault is suggesting that he is best read backwards rather than forwards.

Whatever the case may be, Foucault’s introduction of ethics added an undeniable richness to his thought that also transformed how his earlier work is to be interpreted.

2. Morality and Ethics

The most elaborate discussion of ethics that Foucault provides appears in Section Three of the Introduction to The Use of Pleasure.  There, he designates ethics as one of the three primary areas of morality.  In addition to ethics, morality consists of both a moral code and the concrete acts of moral agents.  The former consists of the more or less explicitly formulated values and rules recommended to individuals by the “prescriptive agencies” (for example, family, church, work, and so forth) in which they participate.  The latter refers to the actions of historically real persons insofar as those actions comply or fail to comply with, obey or resist, or respect or disrespect the values and rules prescribed to them by prescriptive agencies.

In addition to a moral code and the real behaviors of individuals, Foucault claims that morality also consists of a third area, namely, ethics.  He commonly and pithily defines it as a relation of the subject to itself, but a more technical definition of ethics is the conduct required of an individual so as to render its own actions consistent with a moral code and standards of moral approval.  For Foucault, conduct is a category that is broader than moral agency and includes both non-moral actions and the exercising of non-agential capacities (for example, attitudes, demeanor, and so forth).  Ethical conduct, then, consists of the actions performed and capacities exercised intentionally by a subject for the purpose of engaging in morally approved conduct.  Suppose, for example, that an individual adopts the prescription of sexual fidelity to her partner.  In this case, ethics concerns not her morally satisfactory conduct that directly satisfies her duty of being faithful to her partner, but rather the conduct through which she enables or brings herself to behave in a way that is sexually faithful to her partner.

Consistent with his distinction between moral conduct and ethical conduct, Foucault also distinguishes between moral obligations and ethical obligations.  A moral obligation is an imperative of a moral code that either requires or forbids a specific kind of conduct, whereas an ethical obligation is a prescription for conduct that is a necessary condition for producing morally approved conduct.  Foucault understands morally approved conduct to be a wide category, as it does not designate just those acts that comply with a moral code – which is, he thinks, a manifestly modern conception of moral approval.  As he is keen to show in his volumes on ancient sexuality, rigorously stylizing one’s daily existence according to self-imposed standards of conduct was at one time the measure of moral approval, and such approval was not limited to conformity to a moral code.  In this regard, the moral valorization of conduct might be, as it was with the ancients, weighted toward the satisfaction of ethical obligations, or, as it is in modernity, weighted toward the satisfaction of the moral obligations that comprise a moral code.

3. The Elements of Ethical Relations

On Foucault’s account, ethical relations are constituted by four formal elements, the contents of which are subject to historical variation:  the ontological element or “ethical substance,” the deontological element or “mode of subjection,” the ascetic element or “ethical work,” and the teleological element or “telos.”  His project in The Use of Pleasure and The Care of the Self is to articulate the sexual ethics in ancient Greece and Rome, respectively, by describing these elements and uncovering the primary ethical obligations for sexual conduct for both epochs.  These ethical obligations are, Foucault contends, deducible by analyzing the four primary themes of sexual austerity expressed throughout all of Western history: the relation one has to one’s own body and health, wives and marriage, boys, and truth.  Although these themes are occasionally mentioned below, the the focus of this section is on the four elements of ethical relations.

a. The Ethical Substance (Ontology)

The ethical substance is the material or aspect of self that is morally problematic, taken as the object of one’s ethical reflection, and transformed in one’s ethical work.  In The Use of Pleasure Foucault maintains that the ethical substance of ancient Greek sexual ethics – an ethics that was exclusively for men of the right inherited social status – was the aphrodisia or the broad range of acts, gestures, and contacts associated with pleasures to promote the propagation of the species and considered the inferior pleasures given their commonality with all animals.  The intensity of the aphrodisia induced the majority of men to behave immoderately with regard to it, and since the moral telos of ancient Greek ethics was a moderate state in which a man had succeeded in mastering his pleasures, the immoderate man was considered by ethicists to be shameful and dishonorable for allowing the inferior part of his soul to enslave his superior part.  It was also considered shameful for a man to experiment or delight in pleasures derived from the passive and subordinate rather than active and dominant role in sexual relations, the latter assigned by nature to men and the former assigned to those incapable of mastering themselves of their own power, namely, women and children.  By violating these limits out of a failure to master himself, the Greek man put himself in the position of compromising his health, household, social standing, and political ambitions.

Foucault maintains in The Care of the Self that aphrodisia remains the ethical substance for Roman sexual ethics.  But unlike the Greek ethicists before them, Roman ethicists conceived the aphrodisia as essentially and intrinsically dangerous rather than dangerous merely because of the fact that their intensity induces immoderate conduct.  According to Foucault, Roman ethicists stipulated that although sexual acts are good by nature, since nature is perfect in its designs, those acts are nevertheless fraught with a dangerous and essential passivity that causes involuntary movements of the body and soul and expenditure of the life forces.  Nature has, as it were, designed sex as good and beneficial but only on the condition that it conforms to its designs.  Thus, although sexual acts themselves were not considered intrinsically bad, when one performed a sexual act without adequate attention to both its dangers and nature’s limits for it one risked exposing both body and soul to illnesses; indeed, acting without consideration for these dangers was a sign that the soul had already been corrupted.  Foucault therefore asserts that the perception of the dangerous physical and spiritual effects of unrestrained sexual activity led to a moral and medical discourse about sex different in kind than that of ancient Greek ethical discourse.  It focused more on moderated use as a means of achieving physical and spiritual health rather than excellence.

b. Mode of Subjection (Deontology)

The mode of subjection is the way in which the individual establishes its relation to the moral code, recognizes itself as bound to act according to it, and is entitled to view its acts as worthy of moral valorization.  The mode of subjection is, as Foucault refers to it, the ‘deontological’ or normative component of ethics.  For example, consider the obligation to help someone in need.  The Kantian holds that pure practical reason vis-à-vis the categorial imperative rationally requires the charitable act and it is praiseworthy to the extent that it is performed out of respect for reason.  The practitioner of Islam, on the other hand, holds that the charitable act is morally valorized to the extent that it is produced out of respect for God’s will as revealed in sacred texts.

The mode of subjection for the ancient Greeks was a man’s free, permanent, and noble choice to fashion his life into a beautiful work according to a program of self-mastery.  The notion of use (of pleasures) was what ancient Greeks used as a standard for measuring the beauty of a man’s work with regard to his sexual conduct.  The use of pleasures refers to how a man managed or integrated pleasures into his life such that their use did not compromise but benefitted his health and social standing.  Appropriate management submitted the use of pleasures to three strategies.  The strategy of need demanded that desires for pleasures should arise from nature alone and be fulfilled neither extravagantly nor as a result of artifice.  The strategy of timeliness required the distribution of pleasures at the right times of the day, year, and life so as to maintain the well-being of oneself, one’s wife, and potential offspring.  The strategy of status demanded that a man use his pleasures consistent with his inherited status, purposes, and responsibilities.

Foucault maintains that ancient Greek sexual ethics was stricter than their moral code, as a man suffered little moral condemnation for his choice of sexual relations, provided he was neither passive nor partnered with someone under another man’s authority.  But submitting oneself to this mode of subjection meant imposing ethical requirements on oneself that were not included in the moral code.  In fact, submitting oneself to this rigorous sexual ethics was seen as a noble and fine choice precisely because it was not morally required.

The mode of subjection for ancient Roman sexual ethics is also an aesthetics of existence, but Foucault is also clear that it is more austere than the Greek ethics that preceded it.  What this means is that Roman ethical obligations became stricter despite a loose moral code regarding sex.  The increased austerity of this ethics is due in part to the perception of an intrinsic passivity of sexual acts, and also because the means of responding to this passivity required greater attention to the rationality of nature (which is not be understood according to the distinction between what is normal and abnormal).  Roman ethicists conceived that the pleasures of sex were derived by involuntary and dangerous movements of the body and soul, and that seeking pleasure as the end of an act only furthered the possibility of corrupting both body and soul. Since for Roman ethicists nothing in nature seeks sexual pleasure as an end but only as a means to other natural goods (for example, procreation, health, spiritual well-being), they maintained that the pursuit of the aphrodisia as an end in itself could arise only from the distortion of the soul’s desires for pleasure.   Consequently, the criterion by which Roman ethicists evaluated sexual conduct was whether it was born of desire conformed to the wisdom of nature.  So, where the mode of subjection of ancient Greek sexual ethics was the use of pleasures, where proper use is exemplified as the strategic integration of the pleasures into one’s life, Roman ethicists understood that nature put universal features into the aphrodisia that were also the key to discovering the prescriptions for their use.

c. Ethical Work (Ascetics)

The ethical work consists of the self-forming activities meant to ensure one’s own subjection to a moral authority and transform oneself into an autonomous ethical agent.  Foucault refers to these self-forming activities as practices or technologies of the self, and also in the ancient sense of askēsis, or ascetic practices.  These practices are not to be conflated with an asceticism that strives for the goal of freeing oneself from all desires for physical pleasures.  To be sure, all ascetic practices are, Foucault thinks, organized around principles of self-restraint, self-discipline, and self-denial.  But not all ascetic practices aim at eliminating all of one’s desires for physical pleasures.

Foucault maintains that the ethical work to be performed in ancient sexual ethics is that of self-mastery.  For the ancient Greeks, mastering oneself is an agonistic battle with oneself, where victory is achieved through careful use of the pleasures according to need, timeliness, and social status.  Greek ethicists understood that this battle required regular training in addition to the knowledge of the things to which one ought to be attracted.  The sort of training a man undertook was aimed at self-mastery through practices of self-denial and abstention, which taught him to satisfy natural needs at the right time consistent with his social status.  The moral end of such practices was not to cultivate the attitude that abstention is a moral ideal, but rather to train him to become temperate and self-controlled.  As such, successful self-mastery was exhibited by the man who did not suppress his desires, but authoritatively controlled them in a way that contributed to his excellence and the beauty of his life.  Foucault suggests that this ideal is exemplified in the literature about the love of boys, which heroized the man who could express and maintain friendly love for a boy while at the same restraining his co-present erotic love

Foucault is clear in The Care of the Self that the ethical work in ancient Roman ethics is also self-mastery, and that the ethicists reconceived the nature of this kind of ethical work.  Instead of an agonistic relationship in which a man struggles to subdue and enslave his desires for pleasures (rather than be subdued and enslaved by them) through their proper use, the work of self-mastery for Roman ethics was forcing the desires for pleasures into proper alignment with the designs of nature.  While the same is true for ancient Greek ethics, the Roman ethicists emphasized it to such a degree that social status and, to an extent, sexual anatomy were abolished as being relevant factors in determining one’s ethical duties.  What becomes essential for this ethics is grasping that all pleasures that are not internal to oneself originate in desires that might not be capable of satisfaction, and whenever one chooses to engage such desires one subjects oneself to physical and spiritual risk.  In all things regarding the aphrodisia, then, careful attention must be paid to deciphering and testing which of one’s desires originate in nature, or maintain a consistency with nature, and which transgress the limits set by nature.

The intensification of the austerity of sexual ethics this change in self-mastery produced is emphasized in marital ethics.  Greek men were not morally required to maintain sexual relations with only their wives, but a man’s sexual conduct was especially excellent when he restrained his sexual activity to his wife.  For the Roman ethicists, however, a man failed to master himself if he pursued sexual relations with anyone other than his wife, for nature designed the man and woman to contribute to each other’s physical and spiritual well-being through their sexual activity together.  Their joint spiritual well-being was considered integral to the harmony of the human community.

d. Telos (Teleology)



The telos of an ethics is the ideal mode or state of being toward which one strives or aspires in their ethical work.  For the ancient Greeks the activity of self-mastery aimed at a state of moderation that was characterized as freedom in its fullest form, and it was understood as a man’s enslavement of his desires for pleasures to himself.  A man’s domination of his desires was expressed in domestic and political metaphors:  he must exhibit the constrained strategizing necessary for maintaining an orderly and stable rule over both his household or subordinates.  The man who controlled his use of pleasures made himself personally prosperous – physically excellent and socially estimable – in the same way that a household or nation prospers as the result of the careful and skilled governance of a manager or ruler, and a man was not expected to be successful in managing his household or exercising political authority and influence without first achieving victory over his pleasures.  The man who failed to master his pleasures and yet found himself in a position of authority over others was a candidate for tyranny, while the man who mastered his pleasures was considered the best candidate to govern.

Roman ethicists conceived the activity of self-mastery as aiming at a conversion of the self to itself, which they conceived as freedom in fullest form.  Through the ethical work of self-mastery an individual conformed their desires to the rationality of nature, which resulted in a detachment from anything not given by nature as an appropriate object of desire.  Roman ethicists did not understand the telos of self-mastery as the authority over pleasures that manifested itself in their strategic use, but rather it manifested itself as a disinterestedness and detachment from the pleasures such that one finds a non-physical, spiritual pleasure in belonging to the true self nature intends.  Nature does not recommend the mere pursuit of pleasures; it recommends the pursuit of pleasures insofar as those acts are consistent with other ends that it wants met.  Hence, the end of self-mastery is achieving a perfect consistency between one’s own desires and those that nature uses to promote its ends.  For this reason the freedom achieved through self-mastery is an autonomy with regard to that which is within one’s control, namely, conforming oneself to nature.

4. The Care of the Self

A major theme that emerges in Foucault’s final volumes of The History of Sexuality and his lectures at the Collège de France is the ethical obligation to care for oneself.  Foucault certainly claims in both those volumes that the care of self is foundational to ancient ethics (UP 73, 108, 211; CS 45-54), but curiously, and despite his titling of the third volume The Care of the Self, he does not provide significant discussion of the care of self in its generality.  Yet his final three lecture courses at the Collège de France attest to the fact that not only did he have a definite view about the care of the self, it is central to the history of philosophy and critical philosophy that he articulated at the end of his life.  This history emphasizes the integral relation between the care of self and the concern for truth, notably on display in the practice of parrhesia (frank-speech), as its central mode of expression.

a. Caring for Oneself and Knowing Oneself

The ancient notion of caring for oneself acquires prominence for Foucault in the first lecture of his 1981-2 course lecture at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject.  For the ancients, Foucault claims, the care of the self was the foundational principle of all moral rationality.  Today, however, caring for oneself is without moral content.  By explaining the ancient conception of the care of the self and its connection to the Delphic prescription to know oneself, famously observed by Socrates, Foucault wishes to diagnose the exclusion of the care of the self by modern thought and consider whether, given his diagnosis, the care of the self might remain viable in modern ethics.

The exclusion of the care of the self is the result of a reconception of two ancient injunctions:  care for oneself and know oneself.  These two injunctions were originally expressed by Socrates – the exemplar par excellence, Foucault thinks, of the person who cares for himself – with the care of the self serving as the justification for the prescription to know oneself.  According to Foucault, Socrates and ancient ethicists understood that caring for oneself was to exhibit an attitude not only toward oneself but also toward others and the world, attend to one’s own thoughts and attitudes in self-reflection and meditation, and engage in ascetic practices aimed at realizing an ideal state of being.  The prescription to know oneself was the means through which one cared for oneself, and Socrates cared for his own soul and the souls of others by using the practice of dialectic to force the examination of the truth of his own thought and conduct and that of his interlocutors.  The salient point for Foucault is that Socrates did not practice philosophy merely as a means of arriving at true propositions.  Instead, his program was to use philosophy as a tool for examining and testing the consistency of the rational discourse he and his interlocutors employed to justify their lives and conduct.  Foucault sees this as a philosophical activity that is fundamentally oriented to the care of the self, for truth is pursued in philosophy for its own good and the sake of ethical development.  Philosophy is by Socrates’ lights a practice essential to one’s ethical development, for it is a spiritual commitment to the truth that requires self-disciplined attention to the character of one’s thinking.

Foucault therefore distinguishes between philosophy simpliciter and philosophy as a spiritual activity.  Philosophy considers what enables, conditions, and limits the subject’s access to the truth.  But philosophy as a spiritual activity – or philosophy undertaken according to the injunction to care for oneself – is philosophy conceived as ethical work that must be performed in order for an individual to gain access to the truth.  This is not to say, of course, that philosophy as a spiritual activity does not seek to acquire knowledge of things as they are.  Rather, it is to say that such knowledge requires right conduct in addition to the justification of a true belief.

The injunction to know oneself was therefore a demand to attend to one’s relationship to the truth as a function of caring for oneself.  A decisive change occurs, however, with the “Cartesian moment” (HS 14).  The kind of self-knowledge that René Descartes seeks in his Meditations on First Philosophy and Rules for the Direction of the Mind is self-evidence or that which would decisively determine the truth or falsity of a proposition through its apparent clarity and distinctness.  Now, knowing oneself becomes merely a necessary epistemic, and not moral, condition for gaining access to the truth.  (The Cartesian moment takes further hold, Foucault explains, in the philosophy of Immanuel Kant, who argues in his Critique of Pure Reason that features of the subject’s own thinking must be constitutive of the very possibility of knowledge.)  Consequently, attending to oneself becomes judging the truth of a proposition, and self-knowledge is not a directive for spiritual and ethical development.  In modernity philosophy is, for the most part (compare HS 28, where Foucault adds some qualification), not the activity of ethical transformation that aims at the existence transformed by truth.

The modern shift in the construal of self-knowledge as self-evidence required changes in moral rationality.  Modern thought construes moral self-examination as the act of determining whether one’s intentions or acts are consistent with moral obligations.  One’s moral existence is therefore reduced to whether or not one satisfies one’s moral obligations, which had the consequence that the care of the self is perceived as either amoral egoism (because it is unconcerned with the foundations of moral obligation) or melancholic withdrawal (because one cannot know one’s moral obligations).  But this is predicated upon a fundamental misconception of the care of the self.  The care of the self is the ethical transformation of the self in light of the truth, which is to say the transformation of the self into a truthful existence.

b. Parrhesia (Frank-Speech)

In the final two years of his life, Foucault began to focus his attention on a particular ancient practice of caring for the self, namely, parrhesia (alternatively, parresia) or frank-speech.  Parrhesia is the courageous act of telling the truth without either embellishment or concealment for the purpose of criticizing oneself or another.  This practice and its history are the objects of his final two lecture courses at the College de France, The Government of Self and Others and The Courage of Truth, in addition to a series of lectures, “Discourse and Truth” (compiled as Fearless Speech), given at the University of California, Berkeley in the fall of 1983.  The chief object of concern is parrhesia as a practice of self that is centered on the relation of the subject to truth, and how through engaging in parrhesia one freely constitutes one’s subjectivity.

Foucault stipulates that there are five features of the parrhesiastic act.  First, the speaker must express his own opinion directly; that is, he must express his opinion without (or by minimizing) rhetorical flourish and make it plain that it is his opinion.  Second, parrhesia requires that the speaker knows that he speaks the truth and that he speaks the truth because he knows what he says is in fact true.  His expressed opinion is verified by his sincerity and courage, which points to the third feature, namely, danger:  it is only when someone risks some kind of personal harm that his speech constitutes parrhesia.  Fourth, the function of parrhesia is not merely to state the truth, but to state it as an act of criticizing oneself (for example, an admission) or another.  Finally, the parrhesiastes speaks the truth as a duty to himself and others, which means he is free to keep silent but respects the truth by imposing upon himself the requirement to speak it as an act of freedom (FS 11-20; see also GSO 66-7).

It is in Socrates, Foucault says, that the care of the self first manifests itself as parrhesia.  (But not only Socrates; Foucault considers parrhesiastic practices throughout the ancient Greek and Roman epochs.)  The essence of Socratic parrhesia is located in his focus on the harmony between the way one lives (Greek:  bios) and the rational discourse or account (Greek:  logos) one might or might not possess that would justify the way one lives.  Socrates himself lived in a way that was in perfect conformity with his statements about how one ought to live, and those statements themselves were supported by a rigorous rational discourse defending their truth.  Because Socrates bound himself in his conduct to his own philosophically explored standards, his interlocutors understood him to be truly free.  Socrates’ harmony is the condition of his use of parrhesia in identifying and criticizing the lack of harmony in his interlocutors, with the aim of leading them to a life in which they will bind themselves in their own conduct to only those principles that they can put into a rational discourse.  Socratic parrhesia therefore manifests the care of the self because its intent is ethical, for it urges the interlocutor to pursue knowledge of what is true and conform their conduct to the truth as ethical work.

5. Ethics and Critical Philosophy

Ethics and critique emerged nearly simultaneously as objects of Foucault’s interest (1981 and 1978, respectively).  Whether or not that was accidental is an interesting area of scholarship.  But Foucault explicitly links them together in the much discussed essay, “What is Enlightenment?”, explaining that his project is critical philosophy precisely because it contributes to our abilities to autonomously fashion and constitute ourselves.  Thus, around Kant, Foucault combines critical philosophy and ethics, and that connection provides greater insight into just how Foucault conceives of ethics and the history of ethics in relation to his own project.  But his self-alignment with the tradition of critical philosophy has become the most contentious issue in the scholarship.  The criticisms are diverse, but all offer some version of the thesis that Foucault either rejects or lacks the normative criteria required for critique.

a. Kant and Foucault

Late in his life Foucault often claimed to be a descendant of the tradition of critical philosophy established by Kant.  However, it is evident that Foucault always maintained an interest in Kant’s philosophy, which is verified by his secondary thesis for his philosophy doctorate, a close reading of and commentary on Kant’s Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (see Foucault 2008).  Additionally, Foucault casually aligns himself rather broadly with critical philosophy in two other works from the 1960’s, The Birth of the Clinic (1963) and The Order of Things (1966) (BC xix; OT 342).  The received view of this period of his work, especially the secondary thesis and The Order of Things, is that it provides decisive evidence of his rejection of Kant’s attempt to place all rational conditions and constraints in the subject (for example, see Habermas 1986, Schmidt and Wartenburg 1994, Han 2002, Allen 2003).  Although Kant disappears from Foucault’s work as an object of explicit discussion, there is some indirect evidence found throughout his explicitly ethical writings that strongly suggests that the self-constituting subject is his target (see again PK 117, EW3 3-4, DP 30).

Kant reappears in Foucault’s thought in the 1978 address “What is Critique?” and he remains an object of attention until Foucault’s death in 1984.  In the later work Kant is no longer discussed seemingly negatively as the philosopher that grounds thought, action, and freedom in the subject’s self-legislated laws of reason, but rather the philosopher who in his 1784 essay “What is Enlightenment?” takes aim at the ways in which human beings arbitrarily constrain themselves in their present actuality.  Foucault departs from the Kantian critical project insofar as he does not seek to provide an “analytics of truth,” which would guarantee autonomous thinking and acting in universal and necessary principles (see, for example, “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking,” 8:145, and Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, 4:431).  Instead, he controversially claims to promote autonomy by engaging in a critical-historical ontology of the present, the purpose of which is to disclose the singular and arbitrary constraints that we impose upon ourselves so that we might, should we possess the courage, constitute ourselves differently.  Or, as Foucault puts it, the goal is to determine “what is not or is no longer indispensable for the constitution of ourselves as autonomous subjects” (EW1 313).  (For more locations where Foucault aligns himself with the tradition of critical philosophy see FS 169-173, GSO 1-39, PT 41-82, EW2 459).

The scholarship agrees that there is a prima facie incompatibility in Foucault’s treatment of Kant, but there is disagreement about whether it is more substantial.  Jürgen Habermas (1986) maintains that Foucault’s alleged critique of the Kantian self-constituting subject cannot be squared with the conception of the self-constituting subject that emerges in his ethical writings.  Allen (2003) disputes this view, maintaining that Foucault never rejects the notion of self-constitution, but rather rejects the uniquely modern conception of self-constitution as it appears in Kantian and post-Kantian philosophy.  A possible alternative is presented by Norris (1994), who claims that Foucault simply does not have a consistent position on the Kantian philosophy, but that need not necessarily diminish our appreciation of his later work.  (It is relevant to this discussion that Foucault himself says he is not above changing his mind.  See AK 17, where Foucault famously responds to critics about his perceived shiftiness by asserting his right to change his mind, which is echoed later in his life at UP 8-9.  See also EW1 177, 225, and FL 465, where admits to changing his views about power and other concepts.)

b. Critique and Parrhesia

The recent publication of Foucault’s lecture courses on parrhesia provide further material for his connection to the critical tradition.  In his conclusion to his lectures at Berkeley on parrhesia Foucault very clearly connects parrhesia to the Kantian tradition of critical philosophy.  He invokes again the distinction between two traditions of philosophy:  the analytics of truth and the critical tradition.  Instead of explaining the former as being merely Cartesian and Kantian, he explains it as a concern with the correct processes of reasoning in determining whether a statement is true (thus, Descartes and Kant exemplify a certain kind of analytics of truth, namely, that which grounds truth in the subject).  On the other side is the critical tradition that is concerned with why it is important to tell the truth and who is entitled to speak it.  He then goes on to say that the seminar on parrhesia is a part of his “genealogy of the critical attitude in Western philosophy” (FS 170), thus aligning parrhesia with Kantian critical philosophy.  In doing so Foucault establishes that his critical philosophy is a practice of parrhesia in a similar manner to the Kantian practice of parrhesia.  In “What is Enlightenment?” Kant engages in parrhesia when he encourages his contemporaries to use their own reason, consistent with universal law, of course, and refuse to merely rely on the authority of others, including the authority of the monarchy and state, as a guide to their use of reason (however, one must privately obey institutional authorities while publicly expressing one’s disagreement with them).  Foucault understands his own critical activity as a form of parrhesia in a sense similar to that which Kant exemplifies in the essay on enlightenment.  Disclosing the historicity and arbitrariness of the previously unquestioned constraints that we impose on ourselves is, Foucault thinks, a parrhesiastic act.  Determining their precise relations is at the heart of interpreting the nature and scope of Foucault’s critical project.  For more, see Flynn 1987, O’Leary 2002, McGushin 2007, and the ensuing subsection.

c. Parrhesia and Self-Legislation


Ethics, Foucault says, is the form that freedom takes when it is informed by reflection, and by this he means that freedom consists in reflectively informed ascetic practices or practices of self.  These informed practices are imbued with an attitude, ethos, or relationship to one’s ethical substance that Foucault understands as the activity of freedom (EW1 284).  One reason that he focused on ethical work, then, is to discover how human beings freely make themselves into moral subjects of their own conduct through techniques or practices of self-restraint and self-discipline.

In The Government of Self and Others Foucault construes parrhesia as free practice of self par excellence.  “Parrēsia,” Foucault says, “is the free courage by which one binds oneself in the act of telling the truth.  Or again, parrhesia is the ethics of truth-telling as an action which is risky and free” (GSO 66).  The language that Foucault uses to describe parrhesiastic freedom throughout this lecture hour is incredibly suggestive of its source:  it is the language of Kantian self-legislation.  For Kant, autonomy does not consist in giving oneself the moral law, since the moral law is a necessity of the rational will; rather, autonomy consists in binding oneself to the law by freely conforming one’s conduct to it (see, for example, Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals 4:31).  This connection suggests that Foucault understands parrhesia as the supreme act of self-legislation and autonomy, where truth rather than moral law plays the normative role  – a point already suggested in Foucault’s claims about the original meaning of the care of the self.  That is to say, it seems that the truth is for Foucault a moral value or a good one ought to pursue.  Parrhesia is the supreme act of self-legislation because the risk and danger involved in the act tests one’s self-discipline and courage in their commitment to the truth.


This casts more light on Foucault’s representation of his project as critical.  Because autonomy is conceived as binding oneself to the truth, truth becomes the practical goal of Foucaultian critique.  This would entail that one is to pursue the truth in both its propositional and non-propositional (or existential forms) as the highest practice of self.

d. The Problem of Normativity and the Aesthetics of Existence

The chief objection to Foucault’s self-alignment with the critical tradition is not focused on his reading of Kant, but whether he has the philosophical resources to support a properly critical philosophy.  When Kant engages in parrhesia by exhorting his peers to use their own reason he is not issuing merely an exhortation, but, per his moral philosophy, he is telling them that their own practical reason obligates the use of reason consistent with universal law.  In this regard, Kant’s parrhesia flows from, and his use of critique is grounded in, his analytics of truth.  But Foucault intentionally steers clear of that project, which raises questions about the legitimacy and force of his critical philosophy.  Now, while criticisms of Foucault’s philosophy are diverse (see especially Taylor 1986, Habermas 1986, Bernstein 1994, and Fraser 1994), a common complaint is that he owes his readers some explanation for why one ought to accept his evaluations of modern ethics.

But it is not at all obvious that Foucaultian critical philosophy is – despite the use of the term ‘critique’ – in the business of evaluation.  It is true, as Bernstein (1994) points out, that Foucault very often uses a value-laden rhetoric.  However, it is also true that his project is critical in the peculiar sense of the unmasking of some previously concealed practice or aspect of some practice as an activity of frank-speech.  His rhetoric is therefore charged not because he has some hidden normative criteria already in hand (as Habermas 1990 alleges), but because, for example, certain individuals operate in a practice (say, penitential practices) under false opinions about its supposed noble goals (for example, defending society).  To this end Foucault need only unmask the tensions and inconsistencies in a practice through his historical labors to make his project critical.

While such a maneuver is consistent with a purely descriptive interpretation of Foucault’s critical philosophy, there is a palpable sense in which he goes beyond mere unmasking to recommendation.  For example, in an interview from 1984, “An Aesthetics of Existence,” Foucault states that moral approval (or mode of subjection) conceived merely as obedience to a moral code is not only disappearing but has disappeared, and “to this absence of morality corresponds, must correspond, the search for an aesthetics of existence” (PPC 49; see also OT 326-7).  On the one hand, this appears to be a descriptive, historical statement of a matter of fact, namely, that the nature of moral approval has changed.  On the other hand, some commentators (O’Leary 2002) interpret such statements as evaluations of modern ethics and recommendations for an alternative standard of moral approval exemplified by an aesthetics of existence.  There is no doubt that Foucault commends those who might undertake an aesthetics or arts of existence (EW1 261), or those who voluntarily and rigorously elaborate their existence according to a set of self-imposed standards that aim at what they take to be the good, fine, and beautiful life.  It is unclear, however, if Foucault is merely commending or also recommending an aesthetics of existence.  Foucault’s critics see no binding or authoritative reason why one ought to pursue an aesthetics of existence instead of, say, egoism unless one has the resources for sorting out good, fine, and beautiful things.  For this reason, critics (see Thacker 1993 in addition to those noted above) who interpret Foucault as recommending the aesthetics of existence find it to be an insufficiently articulated alternative to the alleged decline of modern morality.

Additionally, some criticism of Foucault’s ethical thought is based on a reading that empties the aesthetics of existence of its robust moral content.  While Foucault does not always help himself out in playing up that content (see EW1 261), it is worth paying attention to the fact that an aesthetics of existence heeds the ancient injunction to care for oneself.  This means it is ethically oriented by the care of the self and truth, such that one ought to fashion oneself in accordance with the life that one could reasonably maintain is truly fine and beautiful, and also that the practitioner of an aesthetics of existence demands of others, as he or she demands of himself or herself, that they provide a rational discourse for the life that they believe to be truly fine and beautiful.  So, while Foucault is careful to say that a return to ancient Greek ethics – a male-oriented, class-centered ethics – is neither a solution to contemporary moral problems nor a remedy to the alleged decline of modern morality – and indeed expresses pessimism about its prospects (HS 251-2) – an aesthetics of existence properly reformulated to modernity might prove worthy of consideration as a mode of subjection. In the end, however, Foucault supplies only interesting suggestions and nothing too concrete.  For this reason this area of Foucault’s thought, and its critical scope, remains hotly debated and a fruitful area of research.  For a wide range of essays dealing with the manifold of issues related to ethics and critical philosophy in Foucault’s thought, see Norris 1994, Kelly ed. 1994, Ashenden and Owen ed. 1999, O’Leary 2002, and McGushin 2007.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources and Abbreviations

  • Foucault, Michel.  The Order of Things:  An Archaeology of the Human Sciences.  New York: Vintage Books, 1970 (OT).
    • Chapters 7 and 9 are important for Foucault’s interpretation of modernity, including modern morality, and especially for his much discussed interpretation of Kant’s critical philosophy.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Archaeology of Knowledge and The Discourse on Language, trans. A. M. Sheridan Smith. New York: Pantheon Books, 1972 (AK).
    • Foucault lays out the structure of his archaeological method in both texts.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Birth of the Clinic:  An Archaeology of Medical Perception, trans. A. M. Sheridan Smith.  New York:  Vintage Books, 1973 (BC).
    • Foucault examines the genesis of modern medical perception and experience, which he characterizes in the Preface as both historical and critical.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Discipline and Punish:  The Birth of the Prison, trans. Alan Sheridan. New York: Vintage Books, 1977 (DP).
    • This book is primarily about modern penitential practices, which Foucault understands as one of the most important practices to develop, not coincidentally, at the same time as reform and liberation discourses.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Power/Knowledge:  Selected Interviews and Other Writings, 1972-1977, ed. Colin Gordon. New York: Pantheon Books, 1980 (PK).
    • This volume contains some of Foucault’s most controversial claims about the interrelations of power of knowledge and the nature of truth – claims that might be helpfully interpreted in light of his turn to ethics.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The History of Sexuality, vol. 3: The Care of the Self, trans. Robert Hurley. New York: Vintage Books, 1988 (CS).
    • Part Two, “The Cultivation of the Self,” gives an outline of Roman ethics.  The rest of the text explores changes in ancient Roman ethics and the intensification of the problematization of the aphrodisia, focusing on increased austerity in bodily health, marriage, and the love of boys.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Philosophy, Politics, Culture:  Interviews and Other Writings of Michel Foucault, ed. Lawrence D. Kritzman.  New York:  Routledge, 1988 (PPC).
    • A collection of writings and interviews.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The History of Sexuality, vol. 2: The Use of Pleasure, trans. Robert Hurley. New York: Vintage Books, 1990 (UP).
    • Chapter Three of the Introduction is the most lucid presentation of his theory of ethics.  Chapter One is also noteworthy because it offers some insight into Foucault’s critical-historical project.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Foucault Live (Interviews, 1961-1984), ed. Sylvère Lotringer.  New York: Semiotext(e), 1996 (FL).
    • A collection of interviews spanning Foucault’s career.  Some of the early interviews in this volume contain some of Foucault’s strongest critical rhetoric about the subject.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Essential Works of Michel Foucault, vol. 1:  Ethics:  Subjectivity and Truth, ed. Paul Rabinow.  New York:  The New Press, 1997 (EW1).
    • Items of special note in this volume are “On the Genealogy of Ethics:  An Overview of Work in Progress” (253-280), “The Ethics of the Concern for Self as a Practice of Freedom” (281-302), and “What is Enlightenment?” (303-320).
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Essential Works of Michel Foucault, vol. 2: Aesthetics, Method, and Epistemology, ed. James D. Faubion. New York: The New Press, 1998 (EW2).
    • The essay, “Foucault,” penned in part pseudonymously by Foucault himself, is worth mentioning because he provides an overview of his work in addition to straightforward statements about his affiliation with the Kantian tradition of critical philosophy.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Essential Works of Michel Foucault, vol. 3:  Power, ed. James Faubion.  New York:  The New Press, 2000 (EW3).
    • The essay “The Subject and Power” is perhaps Foucault’s clearest presentation of his view on power-relations and it is relevant to those interested in his ethics.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Fearless Speech, ed. Joseph Pearson.  Los Angeles:  Semiotext(e), 2001 (FS).
    • Foucault covers political parrhesia in the writings of Euripides, Platonic texts on Socratic and philosophical parrhesia, and parrhesia in the Epicureans and Cynics.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Hermeneutics of the Subject:  Lectures at the Collège de France 1981-1982, trans. Graham Burchell.  New York:  Palgrave MacMillan, 2005 (HS).
    • This lecture course, especially the very first lecture, is crucial to the development of Foucault’s conception of ethics and his understanding of the history of ethics.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Politics of Truth, ed. Sylvère Lotringer. Los Angeles: Semiotext(e), 2007 (PT).
    • This volume contains the important 1978 address, “What is Critique?”, which is the first indication of Foucault’s shift of focus from power to ethics, although it is not clearly articulated as such.  It is also noteworthy because it is Foucault’s first extended discussion of Kant’s essay “What is Enlightenment?”
  • Foucault, Michel.  Introduction to Kant’s Anthropology, trans. Roberto Nigro and Kate Biggs.  Los Angeles:  Semiotext(e), 2008.
    • Through a reading of Kant’s Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View and its contextualization with the critical philosophy, Foucault suggests that Kantian philosophical anthropology is at the very heart of the critical philosophy.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Government of Self and Others:  Lectures at the Collège de France 1982-1983, trans. Graham Burchell.  New York:  Palgrave MacMillan, 2010 (GSO).
    • Foucault narrows his focus from the care of the self to parrhesia as a practice of caring for the self.  Foucault devotes the first two hours to discussing primarily Kant’s essay “What is Enlightenment?” but also his discussion of revolution in The Conflict of the Faculties.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Courage of Truth:  Lectures at the Collège de France 1983-1984, trans. Graham Burchell.  New York:  Palgrave MacMillan, 2011.
    • Parrhesia is once again the focus of this lecture course.

b. Select Secondary Sources

  • Allen, Amy. “Foucault and Enlightenment: A Critical Reappraisal,” Constellations 10:2, 2003, pp. 180-198.
    • Allen contends that Foucault is engaged in a critique of Kantian critique in which Foucault is said to claim that Kant designs his critical philosophy around the confused doctrine of the subject.
  • Ashenden, Samantha and David Owens, ed. Foucault Contra Habermas:  Recasting the Dialogue Between Genealogy and Critical Theory.  Thousand Oaks:  SAGE Publications, Inc., 1999.
    • A collection of essays on Foucault’s engagement with Habermas.
  • Bernstein, Richard. “Foucault: Critique as a Philosophical Ethos,” Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate, ed. Michael Kelly, pp. 211-42. Cambridge: The MIT Press, 1994.
    • Not only does Bernstein do an excellent job summarizing the complaints of critics such as Habermas and Fraser, he offers some insightful worries about Foucault’s self-alignment with the critical tradition.
  • Davidson, Arnold I.  “Archaeology, Genealogy, Ethics,” Foucault:  A Critical Reader, ed. David Couzens Hoy, pp. 221-33.  Oxford:  Blackwell Publishers, 1986.
    • Davidson provides a helpful overview of Foucault’s conception of ethics and situation of that conception within his archaeological and genealogical methods.
  • Davidson, Arnold I.  “Ethics as Ascetics:  Foucault, the History of Ethics, and Ancient Thought,” The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, 2nd Edition, ed. Gary Gutting, pp. 123-148.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • Yet another insightful treatment by Davidson of Foucault’s conception of ethics with discussion of the latter’s analysis of ancient sexuality.
  • Detel, Wolfgang.  Foucault and Classical Antiquity: Power, Ethics and Knowledge, trans. David Wigg-Wolf.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • A critical treatment of Foucault’s investigations of ancient ethics, including original discussion of ancient ethics, and his historical methodology.
  • Flynn, Thomas.  “Foucault as Parrhēsiast:  His Last Course at the Collège de France (1984),” The Final Foucault, ed. James Bernauer and David Rasmussen, pp. 102-18.  Cambridge:  The MIT Press, 1988.
    • A summary and clarification of Foucault’s last lecture course, The Courage of Truth, that connects it to his views about and attitude towards the enlightenment, and, given the suggested connections, how to read Foucault as a parrhēsiast.
  • Fraser, Nancy.  “Michel Foucault:  A ‘Young Conservative’?”, Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate, ed. Michael Kelly, pp. 185-210. Cambridge: The MIT Press, 1994.
    • Fraser provides a helpful discussion and commentary on Habermas’ criticisms of Foucault.
  • Habermas, Jürgen.  “Taking Aim at the Heart of the Present,” Foucault:  A Critical Reader, ed. David Couzens Hoy, pp. 103-8.  Cambridge:  Blackwell Publishers Inc., 1986.
    • Habermas maintains that not only does Foucault have an incompatible interpretation of Kant’s critical philosophy, but that he is also not entitled to engage in critical philosophy because he rejects the normative requirements of critique.
  • Habermas, Jürgen.  The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity:  Twelve Lectures, trans. Frederick G. Lawrence.  Cambridge:  The MIT Press, 1990.
    • Habermas mounts a powerful critique of Foucault’s entire thought in two lengthy chapters (Chapters Nine and Ten).
  • Han, Béatrice.  Foucault’s Critical Project:  Between the Transcendental and the Historical, trans. Edward Pile.  Stanford:  Stanford University Press, 2002.
    • Han maintains that Foucault argues that Kant is unable to maintain the distinction between the transcendental and the empirical; however, she contends that Foucault himself is unable to maintain the distinction throughout his work between the transcendental and the historical.
  • Kelly, Michael, ed.  Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate.  Cambridge:  The MIT Press.
    • This volume includes writings by both Foucault and Habermas in addition to essays dealing with value-related issues in both Foucault’s thought and Habermas’.
  • Levy, Neil.  “Foucault as Virtue Ethicist,” Foucault Studies, no. 1, 2004, pp. 20-31.
    • The author maintains that Foucault’s investigations of the care of the self show that his ethical work is best understood as a virtue theoretic ethics.
  • McGushin, Edward F.  Foucault’s Askēsis:  An Introduction to the Philosophical Life.  Evanston:  Northwestern University Press, 2007.
    • McGushin weaves together the various threads of Foucault’s thought as a spiritual practice that is exercised in the criticism of the Cartesian moment and the confluence of normalizing biopolitics.
  • Milchman, Alan and Alan Rosenberg.  “The Aesthetic and Ascetic Dimensions of an Ethics of Self-Fashioning:  Nietzsche and Foucault,” Parrhesia:  A Journal of Critical Philosophy, no. 2, 2007, pp. 44-65.
    • This essay provides a valuable discussion of Foucault’s ‘ethical turn’ and his concept of an aesthetics of existence, including how it is related to a similar view found in the philosophy of Friedrich Nietzsche, a well-known influence on Foucault.
  • Norris, Christopher.  “‘What is Enlightenment?’  Kant according to Foucault,” The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, 1st Edition, ed. Gary Gutting, pp. 159-96.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • Norris considers the complexity of Foucault’s conception of the subject as it appears throughout the latter’s writings and in the context of his relationship to Kant.
  • O’Leary, Timothy.  Foucault and the Art of Ethics.  London:  Continuum, 2002.
    • O’Leary lays out an account of Foucault’s ethics in which Foucault offers an aesthetics of existence as an alternative to the failure of modern theory to ground moral obligations.  Without denying potential problems in this ethics, O’Leary maintains that its goal is self-transformation and experimentation.
  • Schmidt, James and Thomas Wartenberg, “Foucault’s Enlightenment: Critique, Revolution, and the Fashioning of the Self,” Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate, ed. Michael Kelly, pp. 283-314. Cambridge: The MIT Press, 1994.
    • The authors consider Foucault’s reading of Kant and the former’s relationship to the enlightenment, concluding that, while Foucault is not immune from criticism, critics of his work might start with the Kantian ideas that Foucault inherits.
  • Sharpe, Matthew.  “‘Critique’ as Technology of the Self,” Foucault Studies, no. 2, 2005, pp. 97-116.
    • Sharpe posits that there is a theoretical continuity in Foucault’s thought (that is, there is no ‘ethical turn’) insofar as Foucault always maintained the value of Kantian critique as a practice of self.
  • Stone, Brad E.  “Subjectivity and Truth,” Foucault:  Key Concepts, Dianna Taylor ed., pp. 143-57.  Durham:  Acumen, 2011.
    • The care of the self and its relation to parrhēsia is covered, in addition to exploring possibilities of caring for the self in the modern age.
  • Taylor, Charles.  “Foucault on Freedom and Truth,” Foucault:  A Critical Reader, ed. David Couzens Hoy, pp. 69-102.  Cambridge:  Blackwell Publishers Inc., 1986.
    • Taylor argues that Foucault's conception of power-relations assumes views of both truth and freedom that the latter rejects.
  • Taylor, Dianna.  “Normalization and Normativity,” Foucault Studies, no. 7, 2009, pp. 45-63.
    • Taylor deals with the issue of normativity in both Foucault and Habermas, maintaining that Habermas’ conception of normativity might in practice constrain (viz. normalization) rather than emancipate.
  • Taylor, Dianna.  “Practices of the Self,” Foucault:  Key Concepts, Dianna Taylor ed., pp. 173-86.  Durham:  Acumen, 2011.
    • Taylor examines Foucault’s notion of practices of the self in the context of the Christian practice of self-sacrifice, which she contrasts with his own critical practice that, she claims, emphasizes innovative and creative practices of the self.
  • Thacker, Andrew.  “Foucault’s Aesthetics of Existence,” Radical Philosophy, no. 63, 1993, pp. 13-21.
    • Foucault’s notion of an aesthetics of existence is treated, and Thacker maintains that said notion is insufficiently articulated to stand as a criteria for personal decision-making.


Author Information

Bob Robinson
Loyola Marymount University
U. S. A.


Existentialism is a catch-all term for those philosophers who consider the nature of the human condition as a key philosophical problem and who share the view that this problem is best addressed through ontology. This very broad definition will be clarified by discussing seven key themes that existentialist thinkers address. Those philosophers considered existentialists are mostly from the continent of Europe, and date from the 19th and 20th centuries. Outside philosophy, the existentialist movement is probably the most well-known philosophical movement, and at least two of its members are among the most famous philosophical personalities and widely read philosophical authors. It has certainly had considerable influence outside philosophy, for example on psychological theory and on the arts. Within philosophy, though, it is safe to say that this loose movement considered as a whole has not had a great impact, although individuals or ideas counted within it remain important. Moreover, most of the philosophers conventionally grouped under this heading either never used, or actively disavowed, the term 'existentialist'. Even Sartre himself once said: “Existentialism? I don’t know what that is.” So, there is a case to be made that the term – insofar as it leads us to ignore what is distinctive about philosophical positions and to conflate together significantly different ideas – does more harm than good.

In this article, however, it is assumed that something sensible can be said about existentialism as a loosely defined movement. The article has three sections. First, we outline a set of themes that define, albeit very broadly, existentialist concerns. This is done with reference to the historical context of existentialism, which will help us to understand why certain philosophical problems and methods were considered so important. Second, we discuss individually six philosophers who are arguably its central figures, stressing in these discussions the ways in which these philosophers approached existentialist themes in distinctive ways. These figures, and many of the others we mention, have full length articles of their own within the Encyclopedia. Finally, we look very briefly at the influence of existentialism, especially outside philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Themes of Existentialism
    1. Philosophy as a Way of Life
    2. Anxiety and Authenticity
    3. Freedom
    4. Situatedness
    5. Existence
    6. Irrationality/Absurdity
    7. The Crowd
  2. Key Existentialist Philosophers
    1. Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    2. Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    3. Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    4. Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    5. Simone de Beauvoir (1908-1986) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    6. Albert Camus (1913-1960) as an Existentialist Philosopher
  3. The Influence of Existentialism
    1. The Arts and Psychology
    2. Philosophy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. General Introductions
    2. Anthologies
    3. Primary Bibliography
    4. Secondary Bibliography
    5. Other Works Cited

1. Key Themes of Existentialism

Although a highly diverse tradition of thought, seven themes can be identified that provide some sense of overall unity. Here, these themes will be briefly introduced; they can then provide us with an intellectual framework within which to discuss exemplary figures within the history of existentialism.

a. Philosophy as a Way of Life

Philosophy should not be thought of primarily either as an attempt to investigate and understand the self or the world, or as a special occupation that concerns only a few. Rather, philosophy must be thought of as fully integrated within life. To be sure, there may need to be professional philosophers, who develop an elaborate set of methods and concepts (Sartre makes this point frequently) but life can be lived philosophically without a technical knowledge of philosophy.  Existentialist thinkers tended to identify two historical antecedents for this notion. First, the ancient Greeks, and particularly the figure of Socrates but also the Stoics and Epicureans. Socrates was not only non-professional, but in his pursuit of the good life he tended to eschew the formation of a 'system' or 'theory', and his teachings took place often in public spaces. In this, the existentialists were hardly unusual. In the 19th and 20th centuries, the rapid expansion of industrialisation and advance in technology were often seen in terms of an alienation of the human from nature or from a properly natural way of living (for example, thinkers of German and English romanticism).

The second influence on thinking of philosophy as a way of life was German Idealism after Kant. Partly as a response to the 18th century Enlightenment, and under the influence of the Neoplatonists, Schelling and Hegel both thought of philosophy as an activity that is an integral part of the history of human beings, rather than outside of life and the world, looking on. Later in the 19th century, Marx famously criticised previous philosophy by saying that the point of philosophy is not to know things – even to know things about activity – but to change them.  The concept of philosophy as a way of life manifests itself in existentialist thought in a number of ways. Let us give several examples, to which we will return in the sections that follow. First, the existentialists often undertook a critique of modern life in terms of the specialisation of both manual and intellectual labour. Specialisation included philosophy. One consequence of this is that many existentialist thinkers experimented with different styles or genres of writing in order to escape the effects of this specialisation. Second, a notion that we can call 'immanence': philosophy studies life from the inside. For Kierkegaard, for example, the fundamental truths of my existence are not representations – not, that is, ideas, propositions or symbols the meaning of which can be separated from their origin. Rather, the truths of existence are immediately lived, felt and acted. Likewise, for Nietzsche and Heidegger, it is essential to recognise that the philosopher investigating human existence is, him or herself, an existing human. Third, the nature of life itself is a perennial existentialist concern and, more famously (in Heidegger and in Camus), also the significance of death.

b. Anxiety and Authenticity

A key idea here is that human existence is in some way 'on its own'; anxiety (or anguish) is the recognition of this fact. Anxiety here has two important implications. First, most generally, many existentialists tended to stress the significance of emotions or feelings, in so far as they were presumed to have a less culturally or intellectually mediated relation to one's individual and separate existence. This idea is found in Kierkegaard, as we mentioned above, and in Heidegger's discussion of 'mood'; it is also one reason why existentialism had an influence on psychology. Second, anxiety also stands for a form of existence that is recognition of being on its own. What is meant by 'being on its own' varies among philosophers. For example, it might mean the irrelevance (or even negative influence) of rational thought, moral values, or empirical evidence, when it comes to making fundamental decisions concerning one's existence. As we shall see, Kierkegaard sees Hegel's account of religion in terms of the history of absolute spirit as an exemplary confusion of faith and reason. Alternatively, it might be a more specifically theological claim: the existence of a transcendent deity is not relevant to (or is positively detrimental to) such decisions (a view broadly shared by Nietzsche and Sartre). Finally, being on its own might signify the uniqueness of human existence, and thus the fact that it cannot understand itself in terms of other kinds of existence (Heidegger and Sartre).

Related to anxiety is the concept of authenticity, which is let us say the existentialist spin on the Greek notion of 'the good life'. As we shall see, the authentic being would be able to recognise and affirm the nature of existence (we shall shortly specify some of the aspects of this, such as absurdity and freedom). Not, though, recognise the nature of existence as an intellectual fact, disengaged from life; but rather, the authentic being lives in accordance with this nature. The notion of authenticity is sometimes seen as connected to individualism. This is only reinforced by the contrast with a theme we will discuss below, that of the 'crowd'. Certainly, if authenticity involves 'being on one's own', then there would seem to be some kind of value in celebrating and sustaining one's difference and independence from others. However, many existentialists see individualism as a historical and cultural trend (for example Nietzsche), or dubious political value (Camus), rather than a necessary component of authentic existence. Individualism tends to obscure the particular types of collectivity that various existentialists deem important.

For many existentialists, the conditions of the modern world make authenticity especially difficult. For example, many existentialists would join other philosophers (such as the Frankfurt School) in condemning an instrumentalist conception of reason and value. The utilitarianism of Mill measured moral value and justice also in terms of the consequences of actions. Later liberalism would seek to absorb nearly all functions of political and social life under the heading of economic performance. Evaluating solely in terms of the measurable outcomes of production was seen as reinforcing the secularisation of the institutions of political, social or economic life; and reinforcing also the abandonment of any broader sense of the spiritual dimension (such an idea is found acutely in Emerson, and is akin to the concerns of Kierkegaard). Existentialists such as Martin Heidegger, Hanna Arendt or Gabriel Marcel viewed these social movements in terms of a narrowing of the possibilities of human thought to the instrumental or technological. This narrowing involved thinking of the world in terms of resources, and thinking of all human action as a making, or indeed as a machine-like 'function'.

c. Freedom

The next key theme is freedom. Freedom can usefully be linked to the concept of anguish, because my freedom is in part defined by the isolation of my decisions from any determination by a deity, or by previously existent values or knowledge. Many existentialists identified the 19th and 20th centuries as experiencing a crisis of values. This might be traced back to familiar reasons such as an increasingly secular society, or the rise of scientific or philosophical movements that questioned traditional accounts of value (for example Marxism or Darwinism), or the shattering experience of two world wars and the phenomenon of mass genocide. It is important to note, however, that for existentialism these historical conditions do not create the problem of anguish in the face of freedom, but merely cast it into higher relief. Likewise, freedom entails something like responsibility, for myself and for my actions. Given that my situation is one of being on its own – recognised in anxiety – then both my freedom and my responsibility are absolute. The isolation that we discussed above means that there is nothing else that acts through me, or that shoulders my responsibility. Likewise, unless human existence is to be understood as arbitrarily changing moment to moment, this freedom and responsibility must stretch across time. Thus, when I exist as an authentically free being, I assume responsibility for my whole life, for a ‘project’ or a ‘commitment’. We should note here that many of the existentialists take on a broadly Kantian notion of freedom: freedom as autonomy. This means that freedom, rather than being randomness or arbitrariness, consists in the binding of oneself to a law, but a law that is given by the self in recognition of its responsibilities. This borrowing from Kant, however, is heavily qualified by the next theme.

d. Situatedness

The next common theme we shall call ‘situatedness’. Although my freedom is absolute, it always takes place in a particular context. My body and its characteristics, my circumstances in a historical world, and my past, all weigh upon freedom. This is what makes freedom meaningful. Suppose I tried to exist as free, while pretending to be in abstraction from the situation. In that case I will have no idea what possibilities are open to me and what choices need to be made, here and now. In such a case, my freedom will be naïve or illusory. This concrete notion of freedom has its philosophical genesis in Hegel, and is generally contrasted to the pure rational freedom described by Kant. Situatedness is related to a notion we discussed above under the heading of philosophy as a way of life: the necessity of viewing or understanding life and existence from the ‘inside’.  For example, many 19th century intellectuals were interested in ancient Greece, Rome, the Medieval period, or the orient, as alternative models of a less spoiled, more integrated form of life. Nietzsche, to be sure, shared these interests, but he did so not uncritically: because the human condition is characterised by being historically situated, it cannot simply turn back the clock or decide all at once to be other than it is (Sartre especially shares this view). Heidegger expresses a related point in this way: human existence cannot be abstracted from its world because being-in-the-world is part of the ontological structure of that existence. Many existentialists take my concretely individual body, and the specific type of life that my body lives, as a primary fact about me (for example, Nietzsche, Scheler or Merleau-Ponty). I must also be situated socially: each of my acts says something about how I view others but, reciprocally, each of their acts is a view about what I am. My freedom is always situated with respect to the judgements of others. This particular notion comes from Hegel’s analysis of ‘recognition’, and is found especially in Sartre, de Beauvoir and Jaspers. Situatedness in general also has an important philosophical antecedent in Marx: economic and political conditions are not contingent features with respect to universal human nature, but condition that nature from the ground up.

e. Existence

Although, of course, existentialism takes its name from the philosophical theme of 'existence', this does not entail that there is homogeneity in the manner existence is to be understood. One point on which there is agreement, though, is that the existence with which we should be concerned here is not just any existent thing, but human existence. There is thus an important difference between distinctively human existence and anything else, and human existence is not to be understood on the model of things, that is, as objects of knowledge. One might think that this is an old idea, rooted in Plato's distinction between matter and soul, or Descartes' between extended and thinking things. But these distinctions appear to be just differences between two types of things. Descartes in particular, however, is often criticised by the existentialists for subsuming both under the heading 'substance', and thus treating what is distinctive in human existence as indeed a thing or object, albeit one with different properties. (Whether the existentialist characterisation of Plato or Descartes is accurate is a different question.) The existentialists thus countered the Platonic or Cartesian conception with a model that resembles more the Aristotelian as developed in the Nichomachean Ethics. The latter idea arrives in existentialist thought filtered through Leibniz and Spinoza and the notion of a striving for existence. Equally important is the elevation of the practical above the theoretical in German Idealists. Particularly in Kant, who stressed the primacy of the 'practical', and then in Fichte and early Schelling, we find the notion that human existence is action. Accordingly, in Nietzsche and Sartre we find the notion that the human being is all and only what that being does. My existence consists of forever bringing myself into being – and, correlatively, fleeing from the dead, inert thing that is the totality of my past actions. Although my acts are free, I am not free not to act; thus existence is characterised also by 'exigency' (Marcel). For many existentialists, authentic existence involves a certain tension be recognised and lived through, but not resolved: this tension might be between the animal and the rational (important in Nietzsche) or between facticity and transcendence (Sartre and de Beauvoir).

In the 19th and 20th centuries, the human sciences (such as psychology, sociology or economics) were coming to be recognised as powerful and legitimate sciences. To some extend at least their assumptions and methods seemed to be borrowed from the natural sciences. While philosophers such as Dilthey and later Gadamer were concerned to show that the human sciences had to have a distinctive method, the existentialists were inclined to go further. The free, situated human being is not an object of knowledge in the sense the human always exists as the possibility of transcending any knowledge of it. There is a clear relation between such an idea and the notion of the 'transcendence of the other' found in the ethical phenomenology of Emmanuel Levinas.

f. Irrationality/Absurdity

Among the most famous ideas associated with existentialism is that of 'absurdity'. Human existence might be described as 'absurd' in one of the following senses. First, many existentialists argued that nature as a whole has no design, no reason for existing. Although the natural world can apparently be understood by physical science or metaphysics, this might be better thought of as 'description' than either understanding or explanation. Thus, the achievements of the natural sciences also empty nature of value and meaning. Unlike a created cosmos, for example, we cannot expect the scientifically described cosmos to answer our questions concerning value or meaning. Moreover, such description comes at the cost of a profound falsification of nature: namely, the positing of ideal entities such as 'laws of nature', or the conflation of all reality under a single model of being. Human beings can and should become profoundly aware of this lack of reason and the impossibility of an immanent understanding of it. Camus, for example, argues that the basic scene of human existence is its confrontation with this mute irrationality.  A second meaning of the absurd is this: my freedom will not only be undetermined by knowledge or reason, but from the point of view of the latter my freedom will even appear absurd. Absurdity is thus closely related to the theme of 'being on its own', which we discussed above under the heading of anxiety. Even if I choose to follow a law that I have given myself, my choice of law will appear absurd, and likewise will my continuously reaffirmed choice to follow it. Third, human existence as action is doomed to always destroy itself. A free action, once done, is no longer free; it has become an aspect of the world, a thing. The absurdity of human existence then seems to lie in the fact that in becoming myself (a free existence) I must be what I am not (a thing).  If I do not face up to this absurdity, and choose to be or pretend to be thing-like, I exist inauthentically (the terms in this formulation are Sartre's).

g. The Crowd

Existentialism generally also carries a social or political dimension. Insofar as he or she is authentic, the freedom of the human being will show a certain 'resolution' or 'commitment', and this will involve also the being – and particularly the authentic being – of others. For example, Nietzsche thus speaks of his (or Zarathustra's) work in aiding the transformation of the human, and there is also in Nietzsche a striking analysis of the concept of friendship; for Heidegger, there must be an authentic mode of being-with others, although he does not develop this idea at length; the social and political aspect of authentic commitment is much more clear in Sartre, de Beauvoir and Camus.

That is the positive side of the social or political dimension. However, leading up to this positive side, there is a description of the typical forms that inauthentic social or political existence takes. Many existentialists employ terms such as 'crowd', 'horde' (Scheler) or the 'masses' (José Ortega y Gasset). Nietzsche's deliberately provocative expression, 'the herd', portrays the bulk of humanity not only as animal, but as docile and domesticated animals. Notice that these are all collective terms: inauthenticity manifests itself as de-individuated or faceless. Instead of being formed authentically in freedom and anxiety, values are just accepted from others because ‘that is what everybody does’. These terms often carry a definite historical resonance, embodying a critique of specifically modern modes of human existence. All of the following might be seen as either causes or symptoms of a world that is 'fallen' or 'broken' (Marcel): the technology of mass communication (Nietzsche is particularly scathing about newspapers and journalists; in Two Ages, Kierkegaard says something very similar), empty religious observances, the specialisation of labour and social roles, urbanisation and industrialisation. The theme of the crowd poses a question also to the positive social or political dimension of existentialism: how could a collective form of existence ever be anything other than inauthentic? The 19th and 20th century presented a number of mass political ideologies which might be seen as posing a particularly challenging environment for authentic and free existence. For example, nationalism came in for criticism particularly by Nietzsche. Socialism and communism: after WWII, Sartre was certainly a communist, but even then unafraid to criticise both the French communist party and the Soviet Union for rigid or inadequately revolutionary thinking. Democracy: Aristotle in book 5 of his Politics distinguishes between democracy and ochlocracy, which latter essentially means rule by those incapable of ruling even themselves. Many existentialists would identify the latter with the American and especially French concept of 'democracy'. Nietzsche and Ortega y Gasset both espoused a broadly aristocratic criterion for social and political leadership.

2. Key Existentialist Philosophers

a. Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855) as an Existentialist Philosopher

Kierkegaard was many things: philosopher, religious writer, satirist, psychologist, journalist, literary critic and generally considered the ‘father’ of existentialism. Being born (in Copenhagen) to a wealthy family enabled him to devote his life to the pursuits of his intellectual interests as well as to distancing himself from the ‘everyday man’ of his times.

Kierkegaard’s most important works are pseudonymous, written under fictional names, often very obviously fictional. The issue of pseudonymity has been variously interpreted as a literary device, a personal quirk or as an illustration of the constant tension between the philosophical truth and existential or personal truth. We have already seen that for the existentialists it is of equal importance what one says and the way in which something is said. This forms part of the attempt to return to a more authentic way of philosophising, firstly exemplified by the Greeks. In a work like Either/Or (primarily a treatise against the Hegelians) theoretical reflections are followed by reflections on how to seduce girls. The point is to stress the distance between the anonymously and logically produced truths of the logicians and the personal truths of existing individuals. Every pseudonymous author is a symbol for an existing individual and at times his very name is the key to the mysteries of his existence (like in the case of Johanes de Silentio, fictional author of Fear and Trembling, where the mystery of Abraham’s actions cannot be told, being a product of and belonging to silence).

Kierkegaard has been associated with a notion of truth as subjective (or personal); but what does this mean? The issue is linked with his notorious confrontation with the Danish Church and the academic environment of his days. Kierkegaard’s work takes place against the background of an academia dominated by Hegelian dialectics and a society which reduces the communication with the divine to the everyday observance of the ritualistic side of an institutionalized Christianity. Hegel is for Kierkegaard his arch-enemy not only because of what he writes but also what he represents. Hegel is guilty for Kierkegaard because he reduced the living truth of Christianity (the fact that God suffered and died on the Cross) to just another moment, which necessarily will be overcome, in the dialectical development of the Spirit. While Hegel treats “God” as a Begriff (a concept), for Kierkegaard the truth of Christianity signifies the very paradoxicality of faith: that is, that it is possible for the individual to go beyond the ‘ethical’ and nevertheless or rather because of this very act of disobedience to be loved by ‘God’. Famously, for Hegel ‘all that is real is rational’ – where rationality means the historically articulated, dialectical progression of Spirit – whereas for Kierkegaard the suspension of rationality is the very secret of Christianity. Against the cold logic of the Hegelian system Kierkegaard seeks “a truth which is truth for me” (Kierkegaard 1996:32). Christianity in particular represents the attempt to offer one’s life to the service of the divine. This cannot be argued, it can only be lived. While a theologian will try to argue for the validity of his positions by arguing and counter-arguing, a true Christian will try to live his life the way Jesus lived it. This evidently marks the continuation of the Hellenic idea of philosophy as a way of life, exemplified in the person of Socrates who did not write treatises, but who died for his ideas. Before the logical concepts of the theologians (in the words of Martin Heidegger who was hugely influenced by Kierkegaard) “man can neither fall to his knees in awe nor can he play music and dance before this god” (Heidegger 2002:42). The idea of ‘subjective truth’ will have serious consequences to the philosophical understanding of man. Traditionally defined as animale rationale (the rational animal) by Aristotle and for a long time worshiped as such by generations of philosophical minds, Kierkegaard comes now to redefine the human as the ‘passionate animal’. What counts in man is the intensity of his emotions and his willingness to believe (contra the once all powerful reason) in that which cannot be understood. The opening up by Kierkegaard of this terra incognita of man’s inner life will come to play a major role for later existentialists (most importantly for Nietzsche) and will bring to light the failings and the weaknesses of an over-optimistic (because modelled after the Natural sciences) model of philosophy which was taught to talk a lot concerning the ‘truth’ of the human, when all it understood about the human was a mutilated version.

In the Garden of Eden, Adam and Eve lived in a state of innocence in communication with God and in harmony with their physical environment. The expulsion from the Garden opened up a wide range of new possibilities for them and thus the problem of anxiety arose. Adam (the Hebrew word for man) is now free to determine through his actions the route of things. Naturally, there is a tension here. The human, created in God’s image, is an infinite being. Like God he also can choose and act according to his will. Simultaneously, though, he is a finite being since he is restricted by his body, particular socioeconomic conditions and so forth. This tension between the finite and infinite is the source of anxiety. But unlike a Hegelian analysis, Kierkegaard does not look for a way out from anxiety; on the contrary he stresses its positive role in the flourishing of the human. As he characteristically puts it: “Because he is a synthesis, he can be in anxiety; and the more profoundly he is in anxiety, the greater is the man” (Kierkegaard 1980:154). The prioritization of anxiety as a fundamental trait of the human being is a typical existentialist move, eager to assert the positive role of emotions for human life.

Perhaps the most famous work of Kierkegaard was Fear and Trembling, a short book which exhibits many of the issues raised by him throughout his career. Fear and Trembling retells the story of the attempted sacrifice of Isaac by his father Abraham. God tells Abraham that in order to prove his faith he has to sacrifice his only son. Abraham obeys, but at the last moment God intervenes and saves Isaac. What is the moral of the story? According to our moral beliefs, shouldn’t Abraham refuse to execute God’s vicious plan? Isn’t one of the fundamental beliefs of Christianity the respect to the life of other? The answer is naturally affirmative. Abraham should refuse God, and he should respect the ethical law. Then Abraham would be in a good relation with the Law itself as in the expression ‘a law abiding citizen’. On the contrary what Abraham tries to achieve is a personal relation with the author of the moral law. This author is neither a symbolic figure nor an abstract idea; he is someone with a name. The name of ’God’ is the unpronounceable Tetragrammaton (YHVE), the unpronounceability indicates the simultaneous closeness and distance of the great Other. The Christian God then, the author of the moral law at his will suspends the law and demands his unlawful wish be obeyed. Jacques Derrida notes that the temptation is now for Abraham the ethical law itself (Derrida 1998:162): he must resist ethics, this is the mad logic of God. The story naturally raises many problems. Is not such a subjectivist model of truth and religion plainly dangerous? What if someone was to support his acts of violence as a command of God? Kierkegaard’s response would be to suggest that it is only because Abraham loved Isaac with all his heart that the sacrifice could take place. “He must love Isaac with his whole soul....only then can he sacrifice him” (Kierkegaard 1983:74). Abraham’s faith is proved by the strength of his love for his son. However, this doesn’t fully answer the question of legitimacy, even if we agree that Abraham believed that God loved him so that he would somehow spare him. Kierkegaard also differentiates between the act of Abraham and the act of a tragic hero (like Agamemnon sacrificing his daughter Iphigenia). The tragic hero’s act is a product of calculation. What is better to do? What would be more beneficial? Abraham stands away from all sorts of calculations, he stands alone, that is, free in front of the horror religiosus, the price and the reward of faith.

b. Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) as an Existentialist Philosopher

“I know my lot. Some day my name will be linked to the memory of something monstrous, of a crisis as yet unprecedented on earth...” (Nietzsche 2007:88).  Remarkably, what in 1888 sounded like megalomania came some years later to be realized. The name ‘Nietzsche’ has been linked with an array of historical events, philosophical concepts and widespread popular legends. Above all, Nietzsche has managed somehow to associate his name with the turmoil of a crisis. For a while this crisis was linked to the events of WWII. The exploitation of his teaching by the Nazi ideologues (notably Alfred Rosenberg and Alfred Baeumler), although utterly misdirected, arguably had its source in Nietzsche’s own “aristocratic radicalism”. More generally, the crisis refers to the prospect of a future lacking of any meaning. This is a common theme for all the existentialists to be sure. The prospect of millennia of nihilism (the devaluation of the highest values) inaugurates for Nietzsche the era in which the human itself, for the first time in its history, is called to give meaning both to its own existence and to the existence of the world. This is an event of a cataclysmic magnitude, from now on there are neither guidelines to be followed, lighthouses to direct us, and no right answers but only experiments to be conducted with unknown results.

Many existentialists, in their attempt to differentiate the value of individual existence from the alienating effects of the masses, formed an uneasy relation with the value of the ‘everyday man’. The ‘common’ man was thought to be lacking in will, taste in matter of aesthetics, and individuality in the sense that the assertion of his existence comes exclusively from his participation in larger groups and from the ‘herd’ mentality with which these groups infuse their members. Nietzsche believed that men in society are divided and ordered according to their willingness and capacity to participate in a life of spiritual and cultural transformation. Certainly not everyone wishes this participation and Nietzsche’s condemnation of those unwilling to challenge their fundamental beliefs is harsh; however it would be a mistake to suggest that Nietzsche thought their presence dispensable. In various aphorisms he stresses the importance of the ‘common’ as a necessary prerequisite for both the growth and the value of the ‘exceptional’. Such an idea clashes with our ‘modern’ sensitivities (themselves a product of a particular training). However, one has to recognize that there are no philosophers without presuppositions, and that Nietzsche’s insistence on the value of the exceptional marks his own beginning and his own understanding of the mission of thought.

Despite the dubious politics that the crisis of meaning gave rise to, the crisis itself is only an after-effect of a larger and deeper challenge that Nietzsche’s work identifies and poses. For Nietzsche the crisis of meaning is inextricably linked to the crisis of religious consciousness in the West. Whereas for Kierkegaard the problem of meaning was to be resolved through the individual’s relation to the Divine, for Nietzsche the militantly anti-Christian, the problem of meaning is rendered possible at all because of the demise of the Divine. As he explains in The Genealogy of Morality, it is only after the cultivation of truth as a value by the priest that truth comes to question its own value and function. What truth discovers is that at the ground of all truth lies an unquestionable faith in the value of truth. Christianity is destroyed when it is pushed to tell the truth about itself, when the illusions of the old ideals are revealed. What is called ‘The death of God’ is also then the death of truth (though not of the value of truthfulness); this is an event of immense consequences for the future.

But one has to be careful here. Generations of readers, by concentrating on the event of the actual announcement of the 'death of God', have completely missed madman’s woeful mourning which follows the announcement. “‘Where is God?’ he cried; ‘I‘ll tell you! We have killed him – you and I! We are all his murderers. But how did we do this? How were we able to drink up the sea? Who gave us the sponge to wipe away the entire horizon? What were we doing when we unchained this earth from its sun? Where is it moving? Where are we moving to? Away from all suns?” (Nietzsche 2001:125). The above sentences are very far from constituting a cheerful declaration: no one is happy here! Nietzsche’s atheism has nothing to do with the naive atheism of others (for example Sartre) who rush to affirm their freedom as if their petty individuality were able to fill the vast empty space left by the absence of God. Nietzsche is not naive and because he is not naive he is rather pessimistic. What the death of God really announces is the demise of the human as we know it. One has to think of this break in the history of the human in Kantian terms. Kant famously described Enlightenment as “man’s emergence from his self-incurred immaturity” (Kant 1991:54). Similarly Nietzsche believes that the demise of the divine could be the opportunity for the emergence of a being which derives the meaning of its existence from within itself and not from some authority external to it. If the meaning of the human derived from God then, with the universe empty, man cannot take the place of the absent God. This empty space can only be filled by something greater and fuller, which in the Nietzschean jargon means the greatest unity of contradictory forces. That is the Übermensch (Overhuman) which for Nietzsche signifies the attempt towards the cultural production of a human being which will be aware of his dual descent – from animality and from rationality – without prioritizing either one, but keeping them in an agonistic balance so that through struggle new and exciting forms of human existence can be born.

Nietzsche was by training a Klassische Philologe (the rough equivalent Anglosaxon would be an expert in classics – the texts of the ancient Greek and Roman authors). Perhaps because of his close acquaintance with the ancient writers, he became sensitive to a quite different understanding of philosophical thinking to that of his contemporaries. For the Greeks, philosophical questioning takes place within the perspective of a certain choice of life. There is no ‘life’ and then quite separately the theoretical (theoria: from thea – view, and horan – to see) or 'from a distance' contemplation of phenomena. Philosophical speculation is the result of a certain way of life and the attempted justification of this life. Interestingly Kant encapsulates this attitude in the following passage: “When will you finally begin to live virtuously?’ said Plato to an old man who told him he was attending classes on virtue. The point is not always to speculate, but also ultimately to think about applying our knowledge. Today, however, he who lives in conformity with what he teaches is taken for a dreamer” (Kant in Hadot 2002:xiii). We have to understand Nietzsche’s relation to philosophy within this context not only because it illustrates a stylistically different contemplation but because it demonstrates an altogether different way of philosophizing. Thus in Twilight of the Idols Nietzsche accuses philosophers for their ‘Egyptism’, the fact that they turn everything into a concept under evaluation. “All that philosophers have been handling for thousands of years is conceptual mummies; nothing real has ever left their hands alive” (Nietzsche 1998:16). Philosophical concepts are valuable insofar as they serve a flourishing life, not as academic exercises. Under the new model of philosophy the old metaphysical and moral questions are to be replaced by new questions concerning history, genealogy, environmental conditions and so forth. Let us take a characteristic passage from 1888: “I am interested in a question on which the ‘salvation of humanity’ depends more than on any curio of the theologians: the question of nutrition. For ease of use, one can put it in the following terms: ‘how do you personally have to nourish yourself in order to attain your maximum of strength, of virtù in the Renaissance style, of moraline-free virtue?” (Nietzsche 2007:19).

What is Nietzsche telling us here? Two things: firstly that, following the tradition of Spinoza, the movement from transcendence to immanence passes through the rehabilitation of the body. To say that, however, does not imply a simple-minded materialism. When Spinoza tells “nobody as yet has determined the limits of the body’s capabilities” (Spinoza 2002: 280) he is not writing about something like bodily strength but to the possibility of an emergence of a body liberated from the sedimentation of culture and memory. This archetypical body is indeed as yet unknown and we stand in ignorance of its abilities. The second thing that Nietzsche is telling us in the above passage is that this new immanent philosophy necessarily requires a new ethics. One has to be clear here because of the many misunderstandings of Nietzschean ethics. Nietzsche is primarily a philosopher of ethics but ethics here refers to the possible justification of a way of life, which way of life in turn justifies human existence on earth. For Nietzsche, ethics does not refer to moral codes and guidelines on how to live one’s life. Morality, which Nietzsche rejects, refers to the obsessive need (a need or an instinct can also be learned according to Nietzsche) of the human to preserve its own species and to regard its species as higher than the other animals. In short morality is arrogant. A Nietzschean ethics is an ethics of modesty. It places the human back where it belongs, among the other animals. However to say that is not to equate the human with the animal. Unlike non-human animals men are products of history that is to say products of memory. That is their burden and their responsibility.

In the Genealogy of Morality Nietzsche explains morality as a system aiming at the taming of the human animal. Morality’s aim is the elimination of the creative power of animal instincts and the establishment of a life protected within the cocoon of ascetic ideals. These 'ideals' are all those values and ideologies made to protect man against the danger of nihilism, the state in which man finds no answer to the question of his existence. Morality clings to the preservation of the species ‘man’; morality stubbornly denies the very possibility of an open-ended future for humans. If we could summarize Nietzsche’s philosophical anthropology in a few words, we would say that for Nietzsche it is necessary to attempt (there are no guarantees here) to think of the human not as an end-in-itself but only as a means to something “...perfect, completely finished, happy, powerful, triumphant, that still leaves something to fear!” (Nietzsche 2007:25).

c. Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) as an Existentialist Philosopher

Heidegger exercised an unparalleled influence on modern thought. Without knowledge of his work recent developments in modern European philosophy (Sartre, Gadamer, Arendt, Marcuse, Derrida, Foucault et al.) simply do not make sense. He remains notorious for his involvement with National Socialism in the 1930s. Outside European philosophy, Heidegger is only occasionally taken seriously, and is sometimes actually ridiculed (famously the Oxford philosopher A.J. Ayer called him a ‘charlatan’).

In 1945 in Paris Jean-Paul Sartre gave a public lecture with the title ‘Existentialism is a Humanism’ where he defended the priority of action and the position that it is a man’s actions which define his humanity. In 1946, Jean Beaufret in a letter to Heidegger poses a number of questions concerning the link between humanism and the recent developments of existentialist philosophy in France. Heidegger’s response is a letter to Beaufret which in 1947 is published in a book form with the title ‘Letter on Humanism’. There he repudiates any possible connection of his philosophy with the existentialism of Sartre. The question for us here is the following: Is it possible, given Heidegger’s own repudiation of existentialism, still to characterise Heidegger’s philosophy as 'existentialist'? The answer here is that Heidegger can be classified as an existentialist thinker despite all his differences from Sartre. Our strategy is to stress Heidegger’s connection with some key existentialist concerns, which we introduced above under the labels ‘Existence’, ‘Anxiety’ and the ‘Crowd’.

We have seen above that a principle concern of all existentialists was to affirm the priority of individual existence and to stress that human existence is to be investigated with methods other than those of the natural sciences. This is also one of Heidegger’s principle concerns. His magnum opus Being and Time is an investigation into the meaning of Being as that manifests itself through the human being, Dasein. The sciences have repeatedly asked ‘What is a man?’ ‘What is a car?’ ‘What is an emotion?’ they have nevertheless failed – and because of the nature of science, had to fail – to ask the question which grounds all those other questions. This question is what is the meaning of (that) Being which is not an entity (like other beings, for example a chair, a car, a rock) and yet through it entities have meaning at all? Investigating the question of the meaning of Being we discover that it arises only because it is made possible by the human being which poses the question. Dasein has already a (pre-conceptual) understanding of Being because it is the place where Being manifests itself. Unlike the traditional understanding of the human as a hypokeimenon (Aristotle) – what through the filtering of Greek thought by the Romans becomes substantia, that which supports all entities and qualities as their base and their ground – Dasein refers to the way which human beings are. ”The essence of Dasein lies in its existence” (Heidegger 1962: 67) and the existence of Dasein is not fixed like the existence of a substance is. This is why human beings locate a place which nevertheless remains unstable and unfixed. The virtual place that Dasein occupies is not empty. It is filled with beings which ontologically structure the very possibility of Dasein. Dasein exists as in-the-world. World is not something separate from Dasein; rather, Dasein cannot be understood outside the referential totality which constitutes it. Heidegger repeats here a familiar existentialist pattern regarding the situatedness of experience.

Sartre, by contrast, comes from the tradition of Descartes and to this tradition remains faithful. From Heidegger's perspective, Sartre’s strategy of affirming the priority of existence over essence is a by-product of the tradition of Renaissance humanism which wishes to assert the importance of man as the highest and most splendid of finite beings. Sartrean existence refers to the fact that a human is whereas Heidegger’s ek-sistence refers to the way with which Dasein is thrown into a world of referential relations and as such Dasein is claimed by Being to guard its truth. Sartre, following Descartes, thinks of the human as a substance producing or sustaining entities, Heidegger on the contrary thinks of the human as a passivity which accepts the call of Being. “Man is not the lord of beings. Man is the shepherd of Being” (Heidegger 1993:245). The Heideggerian priority then is Being, and Dasein’s importance lies in its receptiveness to the call of Being.

For Kierkegaard anxiety defines the possibility of responsibility, the exodus of man from the innocence of Eden and his participation to history. But the birthplace of anxiety is the experience of nothingness, the state in which every entity is experienced as withdrawn from its functionality. “Nothing ... gives birth to anxiety” (Kierkegaard 1980:41). In anxiety we do not fear something in particular but we experience the terror of a vacuum in which is existence is thrown. Existentialist thinkers are interested in anxiety because anxiety individualizes one (it is when I feel Angst more than everything that I come face to face with my own individual existence as distinct from all other entities around me). Heidegger thinks that one of the fundamental ways with which Dasein understands itself in the world is through an array of ‘moods’. Dasein always ‘finds itself’ (befinden sich) in a certain mood. Man is not a thinking thing de-associated from the world, as in Cartesian metaphysics, but a being which finds itself in various moods such as anxiety or boredom. For the Existentialists, primarily and for the most part I don’t exist because I think (recall Descartes’ famous formula) but because my moods reveal to me fundamental truths of my existence. Like Kierkegaard, Heidegger also believes that anxiety is born out of the terror of nothingness. “The obstinacy of the ‘nothing and nowhere within-the-world’ means as a phenomenon that the world as such is that in the face of which one has anxiety” (Heidegger 1962:231). For Kierkegaard the possibility of anxiety reveals man’s dual nature and because of this duality man can be saved. “If a human being were a beast or an angel, he could not be in anxiety. Because he is a synthesis, he can be in anxiety; and the more profoundly he is in anxiety, the greater is the man” (Kierkegaard 1980:155). Equally for Heidegger anxiety manifests Dasein’s possibility to live an authentic existence since it realizes that the crowd of ‘others’ (what Heidegger calls the ‘They’) cannot offer any consolation to the drama of existence.

In this article we have discussed the ambiguous or at times downright critical attitude of many existentialists toward the uncritical and unreflecting masses of people who, in a wholly anti-Kantian and thus also anti-Enlightenment move, locate the meaning of their existence in an external authority. They thus give up their (purported) autonomy as rational beings. For Heidegger, Dasein for the most part lives inauthentically in that Dasein is absorbed in a way of life produced by others, not by Dasein itself. “We take pleasure and enjoy ourselves as they [man] take pleasure; we read, see and judge about literature and art as they see and judge...” (Heidegger 1962:164). To be sure this mode of existence, the ‘They’ (Das Man) is one of the existentialia, it is an a priori condition of possibility of the Dasein which means that inauthenticity is inscribed into the mode of being of Dasein, it does not come from the outside as a bad influence which could be erased. Heidegger’s language is ambiguous on the problem of inauthenticity and the reader has to make his mind on the status of the ‘They’. A lot has been said on the possible connections of Heidegger’s philosophy with his political engagements. Although it is always a risky business to read the works of great philosophers as political manifestos, it seems prima facie evident that Heidegger’s thought in this area deserves the close investigation it has received.

Heidegger was a highly original thinker. His project was nothing less than the overcoming of Western metaphysics through the positing of the forgotten question of being. He stands in a critical relation to past philosophers but simultaneously he is heavily indebted to them, much more than he would like to admit. This is not to question his originality, it is to recognize that thought is not an ex nihilo production; it comes as a response to things past, and aims towards what is made possible through that past.

d. Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980) as an Existentialist Philosopher

In the public consciousness, at least, Sartre must surely be the central figure of existentialism. All the themes that we introduced above come together in his work. With the possible exception of Nietzsche, his writings are the most widely anthologised (especially the lovely, if oversimplifying, lecture 'Existentialism and Humanism') and his literary works are widely read (especially the novel Nausea) or performed. Although uncomfortable in the limelight, he was nevertheless the very model of a public intellectual, writing hundreds of short pieces for public dissemination and taking resolutely independent and often controversial stands on major political events. His writings that are most clearly existentialist in character date from Sartre's early and middle period, primarily the 1930s and 1940s. From the 1950s onwards, Sartre moved his existentialism towards a philosophy the purpose of which was to understand the possibility of a genuinely revolutionary politics.

Sartre was in his late 20s when he first encountered phenomenology, specifically the philosophical ideas of Edmund Husserl. (We should point out that Heidegger was also deeply influenced by Husserl, but it is less obvious in the language he employs because he drops the language of consciousness and acts.) Of particular importance, Sartre thought, was Husserl's notion of intentionality. In Sartre's interpretation of this idea, consciousness is not to be identified with a thing (for example a mind, soul or brain), that is to say some kind of a repository of ideas and images of things. Rather, consciousness is nothing but a directedness towards things. Sartre found a nice way to sum up the notion of the intentional object: If I love her, I love her because she is lovable (Sartre 1970:4-5).  Within my experience, her lovableness is not an aspect of my image of her, rather it is a feature of her (and ultimately a part of the world) towards which my consciousness directs itself. The things I notice about her (her smile, her laugh) are not originally neutral, and then I interpret the idea of them as 'lovely', they are aspects of her as lovable. The notion that consciousness is not a thing is vital to Sartre. Indeed, consciousness is primarily to be characterised as nothing: it is first and foremost not that which it is conscious of. (Sartre calls human existence the 'for-itself', and the being of things the 'in-itself'.) Because it is not a thing, it is not subject to the laws of things; specifically, it is not part of a chain of causes and its identity is not akin to that of a substance. Above we suggested that a concern with the nature of existence, and more particularly a concern with the distinctive nature of human existence, are defining existentialist themes.

Moreover, qua consciousness, and not a thing that is part of the causal chain, I am free. From moment to moment, my every action is mine alone to choose. I will of course have a past 'me' that cannot be dispensed with; this is part of my 'situation'. However, again, I am first and foremost not my situation. Thus, at every moment I choose whether to continue on that life path, or to be something else. Thus, my existence (the mere fact that I am) is prior to my essence (what I make of myself through my free choices). I am thus utterly responsible for myself. If my act is not simply whatever happens to come to mind, then my action may embody a more general principle of action. This principle too is one that I must have freely chosen and committed myself to. It is an image of the type of life that I believe has value. (In these ways, Sartre intersects with the broadly Kantian account of freedom which we introduced above in our thematic section.) As situated, I also find myself surrounded by such images – from religion, culture, politics or morality – but none compels my freedom. (All these forces that seek to appropriate my freedom by objectifying me form Sartre's version of the crowd theme.) I exist as freedom, primarily characterised as not determined, so my continuing existence requires the ever renewed exercise of freedom (thus, in our thematic discussion above, the notion from Spinoza and Leibniz of existence as a striving-to-exist). Thus also, my non-existence, and the non-existence of everything I believe in, is only a free choice away. I (in the sense of an authentic human existence) am not what I 'am' (the past I have accumulated, the things that surround me, or the way that others view me). I am alone in my responsibility; my existence, relative to everything external that might give it meaning, is absurd. Face to face with such responsibility, I feel 'anxiety'. Notice that although Sartre's account of situatedness owes much to Nietzsche and Heidegger, he sees it primarily in terms of what gives human freedom its meaning and its burden. Nietzsche and Heidegger, in contrast, view such a conception of freedom as naively metaphysical.

Suppose, however, that at some point I am conscious of myself in a thing-like way. For example, I say 'I am a student' (treating myself as having a fixed, thing-like identity) or 'I had no choice' (treating myself as belonging to the causal chain). I am ascribing a fixed identity or set of qualities to myself, much as I would say 'that is a piece of granite'. In that case I am existing in denial of my distinctively human mode of existence; I am fleeing from my freedom. This is inauthenticity or 'bad faith'. As we shall see, inauthenticity is not just an occasional pitfall of human life, but essential to it. Human existence is a constant falling away from an authentic recognition of its freedom. Sartre here thus echoes the notion in Heidegger than inauthenticity is a condition of possibility of human existence.

Intentionality manifests itself in another important way. Rarely if ever am I simply observing the world; instead I am involved in wanting to do something, I have a goal or purpose. Here, intentional consciousness is not a static directedness towards things, but is rather an active projection towards the future. Suppose that I undertake as my project marrying my beloved. This is an intentional relation to a future state of affairs. As free, I commit myself to this project and must reaffirm that commitment at every moment. It is part of my life project, the image of human life that I offer to myself and to others as something of value. Notice, however, that my project involves inauthenticity. I project myself into the future where I will be married to her – that is, I define myself as 'married', as if I were a fixed being. Thus there is an essential tension to all projection. On the one hand, the mere fact that I project myself into the future is emblematic of my freedom; only a radically free consciousness can project itself. I exist as projecting towards the future which, again, I am not. Thus, I am (in the sense of an authentic self) what I am not (because my projecting is always underway towards the future). On the other hand, in projecting I am projecting myself as something, that is, as a thing that no longer projects, has no future, is not free. Every action, then, is both an expression of freedom and also a snare of freedom. Projection is absurd: I seek to become the impossible object, for-itself-in-itself, a thing that is both free and a mere thing. Born of this tension is a recognition of freedom, what it entails, and its essential fragility. Thus, once again, we encounter existential anxiety. (In this article, we have not stressed the importance of the concept of time for existentialism, but it should not be overlooked: witness one of Nietzsche's most famous concepts (eternal recurrence) and the title of Heidegger's major early work (Being and Time).)

In my intentional directedness towards my beloved I find her 'loveable'. This too, though, is an objectification. Within my intentional gaze, she is loveable in much the same way that granite is hard or heavy. Insofar as I am in love, then, I seek to deny her freedom. Insofar, however, as I wish to be loved by her, then she must be free to choose me as her beloved. If she is free, she escapes my love; if not, she cannot love. It is in these terms that Sartre analyses love in Part Three of Being and Nothingness. Love here is a case study in the basic forms of social relation. Sartre is thus moving from an entirely individualistic frame of reference (my self, my freedom and my projects) towards a consideration of the self in concrete relations with others. Sartre is working through – in a way he would shortly see as being inadequate – the issues presented by the Hegelian dialectic of recognition, which we mentioned above. This 'hell' of endlessly circling acts of freedom and objectification is brilliantly dramatised in Sartre's play No Exit.

A few years later at the end of the 1940s, Sartre wrote what has been published as Notebooks for an Ethics. Sartre (influenced in the meantime by the criticisms of Merleau-Ponty and de Beauvoir, and by his increasing commitment to collectivist politics) elaborated greatly his existentialist account of relations with others, taking the Hegelian idea more seriously. He no longer thinks of concrete relations so pessimistically. While Nietzsche and Heidegger both suggest the possibility of an authentic being with others, both leave it seriously under-developed. For our purposes, there are two key ideas in the Notebooks. The first is that my projects can be realised only with the cooperation of others; however, that cooperation presupposes their freedom (I cannot make her love me), and their judgements about me must concern me. Therefore permitting and nurturing the freedom of others must be a central part of all my projects. Sartre thus commits himself against any political, social or economic forms of subjugation. Second, there is the possibility of a form of social organisation and action in which each individual freely gives him or herself over to a joint project: a 'city of ends' (this is a reworking of Kant's idea of the 'kingdom of ends', found in the Grounding for the Metaphysics of Morals). An authentic existence, for Sartre, therefore means two things. First, it is something like a 'style' of existing – one that at every moment is anxious, and that means fully aware of the absurdity and fragility of its freedom. Second, though, there is some minimal level of content to any authentic project: whatever else my project is, it must also be a project of freedom, for myself and for others.

e. Simone de Beauvoir (1908-1986) as an Existentialist Philosopher

Simone de Beauvoir was the youngest student ever to pass the demanding agrégation at the prestigious École Normale Supérieure. Subsequently a star Normalienne, she was a writer, philosopher, feminist, lifelong partner of Jean-Paul Sartre, notorious for her anti-bourgeois way of living and her free sexual relationships which included among others a passionate affair with the American writer Nelson Algren. Much ink has been spilled debating whether de Beauvoir’s work constitutes a body of independent philosophical work, or is a reformulation of Sartre’s work. The debate rests of course upon the fundamental misconception that wants a body of work to exist and develop independently of (or uninfluenced by) its intellectual environment. Such ‘objectivity’ is not only impossible but also undesirable: such a body of work would be ultimately irrelevant since it would be non-communicable. So the question of de Beauvoir’s ‘independence’ could be dismissed here as irrelevant to the philosophical questions that her work raises.

In 1943 Being and Nothingness, the groundwork of the Existentialist movement in France was published. There Sartre gave an account of freedom as ontological constitutive of the subject. One cannot but be free: this is the kernel of the Sartrean conception of freedom. In 1945 Merleau-Ponty’s Phenomenology of Perception is published. There, as well as in an essay from the same year titled 'The war has taken place', Merleau-Ponty heavily criticizes the Sartrean stand, criticising it as a reformulation of basic Stoic tenets. One cannot assume freedom in isolation from the freedom of others. Action is participatory: “…my freedom is interwoven with that of others by way of the world” (Merleau-Ponty in Stewart 1995:315).  Moreover action takes place within a certain historical context. For Merleau-Ponty the subjective free-will is always in a dialectical relationship with its historical context. In 1947 Simone de Beauvoir’s Ethics of Ambiguity is published. The book is an introduction to existentialism but also a subtle critique of Sartre’s position on freedom, and a partial extension of existentialism towards the social. Although de Beauvoir will echo Merleau-Ponty’s criticism regarding the essential interrelation of the subjects, nevertheless she will leave unstressed the importance that the social context plays in the explication of moral problems. Like Sartre it is only later in her life that this will be acknowledged. In any case, de Beauvoir’s book precipitates in turn a major rethink on Sartre’s part, and the result is the Notebooks for an Ethics.

In Ethics of Ambiguity de Beauvoir offers a picture of the human subject as constantly oscillating between facticity and transcendence. Whereas the human is always already restricted by the brute facts of his existence, nevertheless it always aspires to overcome its situation, to choose its freedom and thus to create itself. This tension must be considered positive, and not restrictive of action. It is exactly because the ontology of the human is a battleground of antithetical movements (a view consistent with de Beauvoir’s Hegelianism) that the subject must produce an ethics which will be continuous with its ontological core. The term for this tension is ambiguity. Ambiguity is not a quality of the human as substance, but a characterisation of human existence. We are ambiguous beings destined to throw ourselves into the future while simultaneously it is our very own existence that throws us back into facticity. That is to say, back to the brute fact that we are in a sense always already destined to fail –  not in this or that particular project but to fail as pure and sustained transcendence. It is exactly because of (and through) this fundamental failure that we realize that our ethical relation to the world cannot be self-referential but must pass through the realization of the common destiny of the human as a failed and interrelated being.

De Beauvoir, unlike Sartre, was a scholarly reader of Hegel. Her position on an existential ethics is thus more heavily influenced by Hegel’s view in the Phenomenology of Spirit concerning the moment of recognition (Hegel 1977:111). There Hegel describes the movement in which self-consciousness produces itself by positing another would be self-consciousness, not as a mute object (Gegen-stand) but as itself self-consciousness. The Hegelian movement remains one of the most fascinating moments in the history of philosophy since it is for the first time that the constitution of the self does not take place from within the self (as happens with Descartes, for whom the only truth is the truth of my existence; or Leibniz, for whom the monads are ‘windowless’; or Fichte, for whom the ‘I’ is absolutely self-constitutive) but from the outside. It is, Hegel tells us, only because someone else recognizes me as a subject that I can be constituted as such. Outside the moment of recognition there is no self-consciousness. De Beauvoir takes to heart the Hegelian lesson and tries to formulate an ethics from it.

What would this ethics be? As in Nietzsche, ethics refers to a way of life (a βίος), as opposed to morality which concerns approved or condemned behaviour. Thus there are no recipes for ethics. Drawn from Hegel’s moment of recognition, de Beauvoir acknowledges that the possibility of human flourishing is based firstly upon the recognition of the existence of the other (“Man can find a justification of his own existence only in the existence of the other men” (Beauvoir 1976:72) and secondly on the recognition that my own flourishing (or my ability to pose projects, in the language of existentialists) passes through the possibility of a common flourishing. “Only the freedom of others keeps each one of us from hardening in the absurdity of facticity,” (Beauvoir 1976:71) de Beauvoir writes; or again “To will oneself free is also to will others free” (Beauvoir 1976:73). The Ethics of Ambiguity ends by declaring the necessity of assuming one’s freedom and the assertion that it is only through action that freedom makes itself possible. This is not a point to be taken light-heartedly. It constitutes a movement of opposition against a long tradition of philosophy understanding itself as theoria: the disinterested contemplation on the nature of the human and the world. De Beauvoir, in common with most existentialists, understands philosophy as praxis: involved action in the world and participation in the course of history. It is out of this understanding that The Second Sex is born.

In 1949 Le Deuxième Sexe is published in France. In English in 1953 it appeared as The Second Sex in an abridged translation. The book immediately became a best seller and later a founding text of Second Wave Feminism (the feminist movement from the early 60’s to the 70’s inspired by the civil rights movement and focusing at the theoretical examination of the concepts of equality, inequality, the role of family, justice and so forth). More than anything, The Second Sex constitutes a study in applied existentialism where the abstract concept ‘Woman’ gives way to the examination of the lives of everyday persons struggling against oppression and humiliation. When de Beauvoir says that there is no such thing as a ‘Woman’ we have to hear the echo of the Kierkegaardian assertion of the single individual against the abstractions of Hegelian philosophy, or similarly Sartre’s insistence on the necessity of the prioritization of the personal lives of self-creating people (what Sartre calls ‘existence’) as opposed to a pre-established ideal of what humans should be like (what Sartre calls ‘essence’). The Second Sex is an exemplary text showing how a philosophical movement can have real, tangible effects on the lives of many people, and is a magnificent exercise in what philosophy could be.

“I hesitated a long time before writing a book on woman. The subject is irritating, especially for women...” (Beauvoir 2009:3). The Second Sex begins with the most obvious (but rarely posed) question: What is woman? De Beauvoir finds that at present there is no answer to that question. The reason is that tradition has always thought of woman as the other of man. It is only man that constitutes himself as a subject (as the Absolute de Beauvoir says), and woman defines herself only through him. “She determines and differentiates herself in relation to man, and he does not in relation to her; she is the inessential in front of the essential...” (Beauvoir 2009:6). But why is it that woman has initially accepted or tolerated this process whereby she becomes the other of man? De Beauvoir does not give a consoling answer; on the contrary, by turning to Sartre’s notion of bad faith (which refers to the human being’s anxiety in front of the responsibility entailed by the realization of its radical freedom) she thinks that women at times are complicit to their situation. It is indeed easier for one – anyone – to assume the role of an object (for example a housewife 'kept' by her husband) than to take responsibility for creating him or herself and creating the possibilities of freedom for others. Naturally the condition of bad faith is not always the case. Often women found themselves in a sociocultural environment which denied them the very possibility of personal flourishing (as happens with most of the major religious communities). A further problem that women face is that of understanding themselves as a unity which would enable them to assume the role of their choosing. “Proletarians say ‘we’. So do blacks” (Beauvoir 2009:8). By saying ‘we’ they assume the role of the subject and turn everyone else into ‘other’. Women are unable to utter this ‘we’. “They live dispersed among men, tied by homes, work, economic interests and social conditions to certain men – fathers or husbands – more closely than to other women. As bourgeois women, they are in solidarity with bourgeois men and not with women proletarians; as white women, they are in solidarity with white men and not with black women” (Beauvoir 2009:9). Women primarily align themselves to their class or race and not to other women. The female identity is “very much bound up with the identity of the men around them...” (Reynolds 2006:145).

One of the most celebrated moments in The Second Sex is the much quoted phrase: “One is not born, but rather becomes, woman” (Beauvoir 2009:293). She explains: “No biological, physical or economic destiny defines the figure that the human female takes on in society; it is civilization as a whole that elaborates this intermediary product between the male and the eunuch that is called feminine” (Beauvoir 2009:293). For some feminists this clearly inaugurates the problematic of the sex-gender distinction (where sex denotes the biological identity of the person and gender the cultural attribution of properties to the sexed body). Simply put, there is absolutely nothing that determines the ‘assumed’ femininity of the woman (how a woman acts, feels, behaves) – everything that we have come to think as ‘feminine’ is a social construction not a natural given. Later feminists like Monique Wittig and Judith Butler will argue that ‘sex’ is already ‘gender’ in the sense that a sexed body exists always already within a cultural nexus that defines it. Thus the sex assignment (a doctor pronouncing the sex of the baby) is a naturalized (but not at all natural) normative claim which delivers the human into a world of power relations.

f. Albert Camus (1913-1960) as an Existentialist Philosopher

Albert Camus was a French intellectual, writer and journalist. His multifaceted work as well as his ambivalent relation to both philosophy and existentialism makes every attempt to classify him a rather risky operation. A recipient of the 1957 Nobel Prize for Literature primarily for his novels, he is also known as a philosopher due to his non-literary work and his relation with Jean-Paul Sartre. And yet his response was clear: “I am not a philosopher, because I don’t believe in reason enough to believe in a system. What interests me is knowing how we must behave, and more precisely, how to behave when one does not believe in God or reason” (Camus in Sherman 2009: 1). The issue is not just about the label 'existentialist'. It rather points to a deep tension within the current of thought of all thinkers associated with existentialism. The question is: With how many voices can thought speak? As we have already seen, the thinkers of existentialism often deployed more than one. Almost all of them share a deep suspicion to a philosophy operating within reason as conceived of by the Enlightenment. Camus shares this suspicion and his so called philosophy of the absurd intends to set limits to the overambitions of Western rationality. Reason is absurd in that it believes that it can explain the totality of the human experience whereas it is exactly its inability for explanation that, for example, a moment of fall designates. Thus in his novel “The Fall” the protagonist’s tumultuous narrative reveals the overtaking of a life of superficial regularity by the forces of darkness and irrationality. “A bourgeois hell, inhabited of course by bad dreams” (Camus 2006:10). In a similar fashion Camus has also repudiated his connection with existentialism. “Non, je ne suis pas existentialist” is the title of a famous interview that he gave for the magazine Les Nouvelles Littéraires on the 15 of November, 1945. The truth of the matter is that Camus’ rejection of existentialism is directed more toward Sartre’s version of it rather than toward a dismissal of the main problems that the existential thinkers faced. Particularly, Camus was worried that Sartre’s deification of history (Sartre’s proclaimed Marxism) would be incompatible with the affirmation of personal freedom. Camus accuses Hegel (subsequently Marx himself) of reducing man to history and thus denying man the possibility of creating his own history, that is, affirming his freedom.

Philosophically, Camus is known for his conception of the absurd. Perhaps we should clarify from the very beginning what the absurd is not. The absurd is not nihilism. For Camus the acceptance of the absurd does not lead to nihilism (according to Nietzsche nihilism denotes the state in which the highest values devalue themselves) or to inertia, but rather to their opposite: to action and participation. The notion of the absurd signifies the space which opens up between, on the one hand, man’s need for intelligibility and, on the other hand, 'the unreasonable silence of the world' as he beautifully puts it. In a world devoid of God, eternal truths or any other guiding principle, how could man bear the responsibility of a meaning-giving activity? The absurd man, like an astronaut looking at the earth from above, wonders whether a philosophical system, a religion or a political ideology is able to make the world respond to the questioning of man, or rather whether all human constructions are nothing but the excessive face-paint of a clown which is there to cover his sadness. This terrible suspicion haunts the absurd man. In one of the most memorable openings of a non-fictional book he states: “There is but one truly serious philosophical problem and that is suicide. Judging whether life is or is not worth living amounts to answering the fundamental question of philosophy. All the rest – whether or not the world has three dimensions, whether the mind has nine or twelve categories – comes afterwards. These are games; one must first answer” (Camus 2000:11). The problem of suicide (a deeply personal problem) manifests the exigency of a meaning-giving response. Indeed for Camus a suicidal response to the problem of meaning would be the confirmation that the absurd has taken over man’s inner life. It would mean that man is not any more an animal going after answers, in accordance with some inner drive that leads him to act in order to endow the world with meaning. The suicide has become but a passive recipient of the muteness of the world. “...The absurd ... is simultaneously awareness and rejection of death” (Camus 2000:54). One has to be aware of death – because it is precisely the realization of man’s mortality that pushes someone to strive for answers – and one has ultimately to reject death – that is, reject suicide as well as the living death of inertia and inaction. At the end one has to keep the absurd alive, as Camus says. But what does it that mean?

In The Myth of Sisyphus Camus tells the story of the mythical Sisyphus who was condemned by the Gods to ceaselessly roll a rock to the top of a mountain and then have to let it fall back again of its own weight. “Sisyphus, proletarian of the gods, powerless and rebellious, knows the whole extent of his wretched condition: it is what he thinks of during his descent. The lucidity that was to constitute his torture at the same time crowns his victory. There is no fate that cannot be surmounted by scorn” (Camus 2000:109). One must imagine then Sisyphus victorious: fate and absurdity have been overcome by a joyful contempt. Scorn is the appropriate response in the face of the absurd; another name for this 'scorn' though would be artistic creation. When Camus says: “One does not discover the absurd without being tempted to write a manual of happiness” (Camus 2000:110) he writes about a moment of exhilarated madness, which is the moment of the genesis of the artistic work. Madness, but nevertheless profound – think of the function of the Fool in Shakespeare’s King Lear as the one who reveals to the king the most profound truths through play, mimicry and songs. Such madness can overcome the absurd without cancelling it altogether.

Almost ten years after the publication of The Myth of Sisyphus Camus publishes his second major philosophical work, The Rebel (1951). Camus continues the problematic which had begun with The Myth of Sisyphus. Previously, revolt or creation had been considered the necessary response to the absurdity of existence. Here, Camus goes on to examine the nature of rebellion and its multiple manifestations in history. In The Myth of Sisyphus, in truly Nietzschean fashion, Camus had said: “There is but one useful action, that of remaking man and the earth” (Camus 2000:31). However, in The Rebel, reminiscent of Orwell’s Animal Farm, one of the first points he makes is the following: “The slave starts by begging for justice and ends by wanting to wear a crown. He too wants to dominate” (Camus 2000b:31). The problem is that while man genuinely rebels against both unfair social conditions and, as Camus says, against the whole of creation, nevertheless in the practical administration of such revolution, man comes to deny the humanity of the other in an attempt to impose his own individuality. Take for example the case of the infamous Marquis de Sade which Camus explores. In Sade, contradictory forces are at work (see The 120 Days of Sodom). On the one hand, Sade wishes the establishment of a (certainly mad) community with desire as the ultimate master, and on the other hand this very desire consumes itself and all the subjects who stand in its way.

Camus goes on to examine historical manifestations of rebellion, the most prominent case being that of the French Revolution. Camus argues that the revolution ended up taking the place of the transcendent values which it sought to abolish. An all-powerful notion of justice now takes the place formerly inhabited by God. Rousseau’s infamous suggestion that under the rule of ‘general will’ everyone would be 'forced to be free' (Rousseau in Foley 2008:61) opens the way to the crimes committed after the revolution. Camus fears that all revolutions end with the re-establishment of the State. “...Seventeen eighty-nine brings Napoleon; 1848 Napoleon III; 1917 Stalin; the Italian disturbances of the twenties, Mussolini; the Weimar Republic, Hitler” (Camus 2000b:146). Camus is led to examine the Marxist view of history as a possible response to the failed attempts at the establishment of a true revolutionary regime. Camus examines the similarities between the Christian and the Marxist conception of history. They both exhibit a bourgeois preoccupation with progress. In the name of the future everything can be justified: “the future is the only kind of property that the masters willingly concede to the slaves” (Camus 2000b:162). History according to both views is the linear progress from a set beginning to a definite end (the metaphysical salvation of man or the materialistic salvation of him in the future Communist society). Influenced by Kojève’s reading of Hegel, Camus interprets this future, classless society as the ‘end of history’. The ‘end of history’ suggests that when all contradictions cease then history itself will come to an end. This is, Camus argues, essentially nihilistic: history, in effect, accepts that meaning creation is no longer possible and commits suicide. Because historical revolutions are for the most part nihilistic movements, Camus suggests that it is the making-absolute of the values of the revolution that necessarily lead to their negation. On the contrary a relative conception of these values will be able to sustain a community of free individuals who have not forgotten that every historical rebellion has begun by affirming a proto-value (that of human solidarity) upon which every other value can be based.

3. The Influence of Existentialism

a. The Arts and Psychology

In the field of visual arts existentialism exercised an enormous influence, most obviously on the movement of Expressionism. Expressionism began in Germany at the beginning of the 20th century. With its emphasis on subjective experience, Angst and intense emotionality, German expressionism sought to go beyond the naiveté of realist representation and to deal with the anguish of the modern man (exemplified in the terrible experiences of WWI). Many of the artists of Expressionism read Nietzsche intensively and following Nietzsche’s suggestion for a transvaluation of values experimented with alternative lifestyles. Erich Heckel’s woodcut “Friedrich Nietzsche” from 1905 is a powerful reminder of the movement’s connection to Existentialist thought. Abstract expressionism (which included artists such as de Kooning and Pollock, and theorists such as Rosenberg) continued with some of the same themes in the United States from the 1940s and tended to embrace existentialism as one of its intellectual guides, especially after Sartre's US lecture tour in 1946 and a production of No Exit in New York.

German Expressionism was particularly important during the birth of the new art of cinema. Perhaps the closest cinematic work to Existentialist concerns remains F.W. Murnau’s The Last Laugh (1924) in which the constantly moving camera (which prefigures the ‘rule’ of the hand-held camera of the Danish Dogma 95) attempts to arrest the spiritual anguish of a man who suddenly finds himself in a meaningless world. Expressionism became a world-wide style within cinema, especially as film directors like Lang fled Germany and ended up in Hollywood. Jean Genet's Un chant d'amour (1950) is a moving poetic exploration of desire. In the sordid, claustrophobic cells of a prison the inmates’ craving for intimacy takes place against the background of an unavoidable despair for existence itself. European directors such as Bergman and Godard are often associated with existentialist themes. Godard's Vivre sa vie (My Life to Live, 1962) is explicit in its exploration of the nature of freedom under conditions of extreme social and personal pressure. In the late 20th and early 21st centuries existentialist ideas became common in mainstream cinema, pervading the work of writers and directors such as Woody Allen, Richard Linklater, Charlie Kaufman and Christopher Nolan.

Given that Sartre and Camus were both prominent novelists and playwrights, the influence of existentialism on literature is not surprising. However, the influence was also the other way. Novelists such as Dostoevsky or Kafka, and the dramatist Ibsen, were often cited by mid-century existentialists as important precedents, right along with Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Dostoevsky creates a character Ivan Karamazov (in The Brothers Karamazov, 1880) who holds the view that if God is dead, then everything is permitted; both Nietzsche and Sartre discuss Dostoevsky with enthusiasm. Within drama, the theatre of the absurd and most obviously Beckett were influenced by existentialist ideas; later playwrights such as Albee, Pinter and Stoppard continue this tradition.

One of the key figures of 20th century psychology, Sigmund Freud, was indebted to Nietzsche especially for his analysis of the role of psychology within culture and history, and for his view of cultural artefacts such as drama or music as 'unconscious' documentations of psychological tensions. But a more explicit taking up of existentialist themes is found in the broad 'existentialist psychotherapy' movement. A common theme within this otherwise very diverse group is that previous psychology misunderstood the fundamental nature of the human and especially its relation to others and to acts of meaning-giving; thus also, previous psychology had misunderstood what a 'healthy' attitude to self, others and meaning might be.  Key figures here include Swiss psychologists Ludwig Binswanger and later Menard Boss, both of who were enthusiastic readers of Heidegger; the Austrian Frankl, who invented the method of logotherapy; in England, Laing and Cooper, who were explicitly influenced by Sartre; and in the United States, Rollo May, who stresses the ineradicable importance of anxiety.

b. Philosophy

As a whole, existentialism has had relatively little direct influence within philosophy. In Germany, existentialism (and especially Heidegger) was criticised for being obscure, abstract or even mystical in nature. This criticism was made especially by Adorno in The Jargon of Authenticity, and in Dog Years, novelist Gunter Grass gives a Voltaire-like, savage satire of Heidegger. The criticism was echoed by many in the analytic tradition. Heidegger and the existentialist were also taken to task for paying insufficient attention to social and political structures or values, with dangerous results. In France, philosophers like Sartre were criticised by those newly under the influence of structuralism for paying insufficient attention to the nature of language and to impersonal structures of meaning. In short, philosophy moved on, and in different directions. Individual philosophers remain influential, however: Nietzsche and Heidegger in particular are very much 'live' topics in philosophy, even in the 21st century.

However, there are some less direct influences that remain important. Let us raise three examples. Both the issue of freedom in relation to situation, and that of the philosophical significance of what otherwise might appear to be extraneous contextual factors, remain key, albeit in dramatically altered formulation, within the work of Michel Foucault or Alain Badiou, two figures central to late 20th century European thought. Likewise, the philosophical importance that the existentialists placed upon emotion has been influential, legitimising a whole domain of philosophical research even by philosophers who have no interest in existentialism. Similarly, existentialism was a philosophy that insisted philosophy could and should deal very directly with 'real world' topics such as sex, death or crime, topics that had most frequently been approached abstractly within the philosophical tradition. Mary Warnock wrote on existentialism and especially Sartre, for example, while also having an incredibly important and public role within recent applied ethics.

4. References and Further Reading

a. General Introductions

  • Warnock Mary. Existentialism (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1970)
  • Barrett William. Irrational Man: A Study in Existential Philosophy (New York: Anchor House, 1990)
  • Cooper E. David. Existentialism (Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 1999)
  • Reynolds Jack. Understanding Existentialism (Stocksfield: Acumen, 2006)
  • Earnshaw Steven. Existentialism: A Guide for the Perplexed (London: Continuum, 2006)

b. Anthologies

  • Kauffman Walter.  Existentialism from Dostoevsky to Sartre (New York: Penguin, 1975)
  • Paul S. MacDonald. The Existentialist Reader An Anthology of Key Texts (Edinburgh: Edinburg University Press, 2000)
  • Solomon C. Robert. Existentialism (USA: Oxford University Press, 2004)

c. Primary Bibliography

  • Beauvoir de Simone. The Ethics of Ambiguity (New York: Citadel Press, 1976)
  • Beauvoir de Simone. The Second Sex (London: Jonathan Cape, 2009)
  • Camus Albert. The Myth of Sisyphus (London: Penguin, 2000)
  • Camus Albert. The Rebel (London: Penguin, 2000b)
  • Camus Albert.  The Fall, (London: Penguin, 2006)
  • Heidegger Martin, Introduction to Metaphysics (New Heaven & London: Yale University Press,2000)
  • Heidegger Martin. Letter on Humanism: in Heidegger Martin. Basic Writings, (London: Routledge, 1993)
  • Heidegger Martin. Being and Time (Oxford: Blackwell, 1962)
  • Heidegger Martin. Identity and Difference (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 2002)
  • Kierkegaard Søren. The Concept of Anxiety (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1980)
  • Kierkegaard Søren. Fear and Trembling (New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 1983)
  • Kierkegaard Søren. Papers and Journals: A Selection, (London: Penguin Book, 1996)
  • Nietzsche Friedrich. Ecce Homo (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007)
  • Nietzsche Friedrich. The Gay Science (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001)
  • Nietzsche Friedrich. Twilight of the Idols (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008)
  • Nietzsche Friedrich. On the Genealogy of Morality (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007)
  • Sartre Jean-Paul. Being and Nothingness (London and New York: Routledge, 2003)
  • Sartre Jean-Paul, "Intentionality: A fundamental idea of Husserl's Phenomenology." Trans. by Joseph P. Fell, Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology, 1970, Vol. 1, No. 2

d. Secondary Bibliography

  • Camus
  • Todd Oliver. Albert Camus A Life (London: Vintage, 1998)
  • Sherman David. Camus (Oxford: Blackwell, 2009)
  • Foley John. Albert Camus From the Absurd to Revolt (Stocksfield: Accumen, 2009)
  • Sartre
  • Cox Gary. Sartre A guide for the Perplexed (London: Continuum, 2006)
  • Gardner Sebastian. Sartres Being and Nothingness (London: Continuum, 2009)
  • Stewart John, “Merleau-Ponty’s criticisms of Sartre’s theory of freedom. Philosophy Today, 39:3 (1995:Fall)
  • Heidegger
  • Beistegui de Miguel. The New Heidegger (London & New York: Continuum, 2005)
  • Marx Werner. Heidegger and the Tradition (Evanson: Northwestern University Press, 1971)
  • Polt Richard. Heidegger An Inroduction (London: UCL Press, 1999)
  • Safranski Rüdiger. Martin Heidegger: Between Good and Evil (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1999)
  • Watts Michael. The philosophy of Heidegger (Durham: Acumen, 2011)
  • Nietzsche
  • Ansell-Pearson Keith. An Introduction to Nietzsche as Political Thinker (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994)
  • Burnham Douglas. Reading Nietzsche An Analysis of Beyond Good an Evil (Stocksfield: Accumen, 2007)
  • Burnham Douglas and Jesinghausen Martin. Nietzsches Thus Spoke Zarathustra (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2010)
  • Burnham Douglas and Jesinghausen Martin. Nietzsches The Birth of Tragedy (London: Continuum, 2010)
  • Safranski Rüdiger. Nietzsche - A Philosophical Biography (London: Granta Books, 2002)
  • Kierkegaard
  • Pattison George. The Philosophy of Kierkegaard (Chesham: Acumen, 2005)
  • Weston Michael. Kierkegaard and Modern Continental Philosophy: An Introduction (London: Routledge, 1994)

e. Other Works Cited

  • Hegel G.W.F. Phenomenology of Spirit, (Oxford and New York, Oxford University Press, 1977)
  • Spinoza Baruch Ethics in: Spinoza Baruch Complete Works, (Indianapolis, Hackett Publishing, 2002)
  • Kant Immanuel An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment? in Kant Immanuel Political Writings, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991)


Author Information

Douglas Burnham
Staffordshire University
United Kingdom


George Papandreopoulos
Staffordshire University
United Kingdom

Edmund Husserl: Phenomenology of Embodiment

HusserlFor Husserl, the body is not an extended physical substance in contrast to a non-extended mind, but a lived “here” from which all “there’s” are “there”; a locus of distinctive sorts of sensations that can only be felt firsthand by the embodied experiencer concerned; and a coherent system of movement possibilities allowing us to experience every moment of our situated, practical-perceptual life as pointing to “more” than our current perspective affords. To identify such experiential structures of embodiment, however, Husserl must clarify and set aside not only the ways in which the natural sciences approach the body, but also the ways in which we have tacitly taken over natural-scientific assumptions into our everyday understanding of embodiment. Husserl’s phenomenological investigations eventually lead to the notion of kinaesthetic consciousness, which is not a consciousness “of” movement, but a consciousness or subjectivity that is itself characterized in terms of motility, that is, the very ability to move freely and responsively. In Husserl’s phenomenology of embodiment, then, the lived body is a lived center of experience, and both its movement capabilities and its distinctive register of sensations play a key role in his account of how we encounter other embodied agents in the shared space of a coherent and ever-explorable world. Many of Husserl’s findings were taken up by such later figures in the phenomenological tradition as Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty, who gave these findings an ontological interpretation. However, Husserl’s main focus is epistemological, and for him, lived embodiment is not only a means of practical action, but an essential part of the deep structure of all knowing.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Sources and Themes
    2. Terms and Concepts
  2. Naturalistic Presuppositions about the Body
  3. Embodied Personhood
  4. The Structure of Embodied Experience
    1. The Body as a Center of Orientation
    2. Distinctive Bodily Sensations
    3. Movement and the “I Can”
  5. Kinaesthetic Consciousness
    1. Systems of Kinaesthetic Capabilities
    2. Kinaesthetic Capabilities and Perceptual Appearances
    3. Kinaesthetic Experience and the Experience of Others
    4. Further Philosophical Issues
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

a. Sources and Themes

Edmund Husserl (1859–1938), the founder of phenomenology, addressed the body throughout his philosophical life, with much of the relevant material to be found in lecture courses, research manuscripts, and book-length texts not published during his lifetime. One of the most important texts—the second volume of his Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, subtitled Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution and usually referred to as Ideas 2—was particularly influential. Heidegger, for example, had access to it in manuscript before writing his own major work, Being and Time (1927), and Merleau-Ponty consulted it while working on his Phenomenology of Perception (1945); indeed, Ideas 2 first became generally known on the basis of Merleau-Ponty’s references to it in Phenomenology of Perception. It has long been known that the text posthumously published in 1952 as Ideas 2 had been shaped by not one, but two editors, Edith Stein and Ludwig Landgrebe (each of whom worked on the text while serving as Husserl’s assistant). But more recent scholarship by Sawicki (1997) suggests that Edith Stein (1891–1942) should be seen as the guiding architect of the work, which she attempted to recast in terms of her own philosophical commitments so as to “correct” what she saw as problems and shortcomings in Husserl’s original 1912 draft. This may be why the text as we currently have it is marked by certain gaps and tensions. In fact, no faithful account of this seminal work will be possible until a new edition is published, fully disentangling Husserl’s own train of thought from Stein’s argument. The present article is therefore based on texts from all periods, and the copious amount of relevant material has been organized in terms of four main tasks of a Husserlian phenomenology of embodiment: bringing naturalistic presuppositions about the body to light; setting aside the naturalized body in favor of embodied personhood; offering phenomenological descriptions of the structure of embodied experience; and demonstrating that transcendental (inter)subjectivity itself must be thought as kinaesthetic consciousness. Before turning to these themes, however, let us pause for a brief overview of some of the key Husserlian terms and concepts used in this article.

b. Terms and Concepts

Husserlian phenomenology stands in opposition to naturalism, for which material nature is simply a given and conscious life itself is part of nature, to be approached with natural-scientific methods oriented toward empirical facts and causal explanations. In contrast, phenomenology turns directly to the evidence of lived experience—of first-person subjective life—in order to provide descriptions of experiencing and of objects as experienced, rather than causal explanations. For Husserl, these descriptions are to be eidetic (or “essential”) insofar as what is being described is not a specific set of empirical facts considered for their own sake, but invariants governing a certain range of facts—for instance, structural patterns that must obtain for something to be an object of a certain type at all, or eidetically necessary laws such as “any conceivable color has some extension.” Husserl’s investigations of essential structures of conscious life and experience further focus on consciousness as transcendental rather than mundane, which means that consciousness is taken not as a part of the world, but as the constitutive presupposition for experiencing any world whatsoever.

Husserl’s technical term constitution takes on many nuances as his work develops. But all constitutive phenomenology is concerned with the correlation between “experiencing” and “that which is experienced”—for example, between perceiving and the perceived, remembering and the remembered, and so on. This “universal a priori of correlation” (Husserliana 6, §46) encompasses not only conscious performances actively carried out by the I (for instance, a judging whose correlate is the corresponding judgment), but also deeper strata of subjective experience that often remain unnoticed in everyday life. They can, however, be brought to light by reflecting on the structure of the type of experience concerned. For example, that only one side of the perceptual object actually appears to me at any given moment has its subjective correlate in the situatedness of embodied experience, so that any spatial thing is always seen from a particular standpoint; at the same time, that I am currently seeing “this side” of the object has its subjective correlate in my capability for movement, since I am able in principle to move in such a way as to bring “other sides” into view. In short, Husserl does not presuppose a subject-object split, but operates with a subject-object correlation—a correlation he works out in detail for almost every sphere and stratum of experience.

Moreover, as the examples indicate, a Husserlian approach to consciousness or subjectivity is not restricted to the realm of the mental as traditionally understood; instead, the phenomenological notion of embodied experience offers an alternative to mind-body dualism. And Husserl’s investigations ultimately embrace not only the achievements and correlates of constituting subjectivity, but also those of intersubjectivity, that is, of the “we” rather than solely the “I.”

Finally, a general feature of Husserl’s terminology must also be mentioned: he frequently takes over words used differently in other contexts and expects the reader to understand these words not in terms of linguistic definitions set forth in advance, but in light of their referents—the experiential features or nuances that he is describing. Thus the Husserlian tradition is not merely a tradition of texts to comment upon or argue against, but a permanent possibility of checking descriptive claims against the touchstone of the appropriate experiential evidence so as to confirm or correct such claims. Bearing this in mind, let us now return to the four main moves accomplished by a Husserlian phenomenology of embodiment: criticizing naturalistic presuppositions about the body; thematizing embodied personhood; describing the structure of embodied experience; and investigating kinaesthetic consciousness.

2. Naturalistic Presuppositions about the Body

Summary: Husserl criticizes the assumption that the body is a psychophysical entity, in order to make “the body as directly experienced by the embodied experiencer concerned” a theme for phenomenological investigation.

Let us begin by sketching Husserl’s response to the philosophical and scientific tradition in which he found himself—and in particular to the naturalism of the positivistic natural sciences, which he addresses through a critique of its presuppositions. He is specifically concerned to demonstrate how a natural-scientific tradition that has inherited a Cartesian dualism of substances (res extensa/res cogitans), and is committed to mathematization as the measure of truth, deals with the “mental” by approaching the “psyche” in terms of the “psychophysical”: it is only by taking intangible minds as localizable in tangible living bodies that natural science can bring the “mental” side of the inherited dualism into the realm of real-spatial causality, and thus into the domain of calculability, prediction, and control. Rather than automatically accepting these assumptions, Husserl brings them to light; traces their historical development; establishes the limits of their legitimacy; and offers an alternative account of “consciousness” or “subjectivity,” an account that relies on rigorous philosophical methods and on a radical turn to the evidence of lived experience, rather than on the assumptions and methods of natural-scientific cognition.

But in the course of carrying out these larger tasks, Husserl highlights a major presupposition concerning embodiment. The received tradition, with its tendency to think in terms of the “psychophysical” (even when one is not actively carrying out psychophysical investigations or making specifically psychophysical claims), not only attempts to tie the “mind” to a material “body,” but is already operating under a more basic assumption—namely, that this body can itself be taken as a physical body (Körper) like any other spatial thing, albeit a thing with certain distinctive sorts of characteristics. For even if “organisms” are the province of special natural sciences (for example, anatomy and physiology) having to do with living rather than non-living things, it is still taken for granted that like “inanimate” objects, the “animate” ones too belong to the realm of real, spatially extended entities to be explained in terms of causal laws. Yet such a presupposition completely ignores what is essential to the body as a lived body (Leib)—as my body, someone’s body, experienced in a unique way by the embodied experiencer concerned. In other words, what is missing in naturalism is the body of embodiment, which must not be taken physically, but as directly experienced from within.

Here Husserl is not challenging the right of scientific practice to approach living bodies in causal terms; in Ideas 3 (originally written in 1912, but not published until 1952), he even proposes a new science—somatology—that would incorporate both physiological investigation of the material properties of the body as a living organism and experiential investigation of firsthand, first-person somatic perception (for example, of sensing tactile contact). But he does indeed insist on clarifying the presuppositions governing natural-scientific cognition, recognizing them for what they are and acknowledging their limits, so that, as he puts it in 1936 in §9h of The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, we do not “take for true being what is actually a method.” Thus the historical fact that living bodies can be, and have been, approached with natural-scientific methods does not automatically allow us to relegate the body of embodiment to the res extensa side of Cartesian dualism. Instead, appropriate modes of inquiry must be developed to do justice to the body of direct experience.

Accordingly, Husserl not only provides a critique of the presupposition of the “psychophysical” (and of the lived body as a physical body), but opens up several further ways in which a phenomenology of embodiment can be pursued. In Ideas 1 (first published in 1913), he sets the body aside in order to reach the realm of “pure consciousness.” Commentators sometimes mistake this strategic move for Husserl’s “position,” and accuse him of postulating a disembodied, desituated consciousness. But the body that is set out of play here is merely the body that is assumed to be the “physical” half of the inherited dualism. Moreover, this is only the first step in the critique: Husserl is effectively suspending the tacit hegemony of the prevailing presupposition whereby it is automatically accepted, as a matter of course, that the body is a physical reality that is a part of nature—and setting this assumption out of play frees us to address the body and embodiment phenomenologically rather than naturalistically. After suspending the unquestioned validity of naturalistic presuppositions concerning the body, then, the next step is to retrieve the body of experience, and Husserl employs various pivotal distinctions in order to open up the experience of embodiment for phenomenological investigation.

3. Embodied Personhood

Summary: Husserl shows that embodied experience is geared into the world as a communal nexus of meaningful situations, expressive gestures, and practical activities.

One key distinction emphasized in Ideas 2 contrasts the “naturalistic” attitude, as the theoretical attitude within which natural science is practiced, with the “personalistic” attitude that characterizes personal and social experience in the world of everyday life—the “lifeworld” (Lebenswelt), the cultural world that is the province of the cultural or human sciences. Within the personalistic attitude, our intersubjective encounters are always experienced as embodied encounters, and our ongoing practical life is already an embodied one. Thus, for example, we greet one another with culturally specific gestures such as shaking hands; we communicate with others, responding to their facial expressions, gestures, and tones of voice; we use tools in practical, goal-directed actions; we rely on bodily capabilities and develop new skills that improve with practice or grow rusty with disuse; and so on. In other words, what we come upon are others embodying themselves in particular ways (serenely or impatiently, adroitly or clumsily, buoyantly or dragged down by pain or fatigue, and so forth): we immediately see embodied persons, not material objects animated by immaterial minds, and the immediacy of this carnal intersubjectivity is the foundation of community and sociality (with culturally specific “normal” embodiment playing a privileged role as the measure from which the “anomalous” and the “abnormal” diverge). Similarly, we make immediate use of the bodily possibilities at our disposal, which serve as the “means whereby” we carry out our everyday activities, without having to appeal to psychophysical explanations: I simply reach for my cup, pick it up, and drink from it, without ever giving a thought to the neurophysiological processes that allow me to keep my balance as I reach, move the cup without spilling the liquid, and swallow without choking. And even if my abilities are compromised by illness or injury, the lived experience of “I can no longer do it” is qualitatively different from the physician’s causal explanations for my condition.

For the most part, Husserl himself provides passing examples, rather than extended analyses, of embodied experience in the personalistic attitude. Yet if we recall that his aim is not to carry out concrete cultural-scientific investigations but to clarify the philosophical bases of the cultural or human sciences, we can see that his critique of naturalistic presuppositions about the body both secures a theoretical foundation for work in such areas as nonverbal communication (as well as other sorts of studies of embodiment carried out within phenomenological psychology, phenomenological sociology, and so on), and anticipates more recent concerns with socially shaped patterns of embodiment (including, for example, issues of gendered embodiment, as contrasted with the biological “sex” of an individual—although even the medical assignment of sex at birth may display, in certain problematic cases, social/cultural assumptions and priorities).

Husserl’s discussions of the “personalistic” attitude in Ideas 2 are echoed in his extensive discussions of the lifeworld in the Crisis, and several further points concerning embodiment can be made in this connection. First of all, for Husserl, the “prescientific” world of experience is more basic than the “objective” world constituted as a correlate to scientific practice in the naturalistic attitude; for example, natural-scientific investigation of the body as an object presupposes a functioning bodily subjectivity on the part of each of the scientists concerned, for whom their own lived bodies tacitly serve as organs of perception, communication, and action, even while they are engaged in carrying out detailed research into, say, the neurophysiology of motor behavior. At the same time, however, scientific assumptions and constructs “flow back into” everyday lifeworldly language and experience, so that, for instance, I may refer to my own body in anatomical terms as a matter of course, or offer causal explanations (rather than experiential descriptions) of my own bodily condition, even in a casual conversation with a friend. Thus although there is a functional priority of the personalistic over the naturalistic attitude, the former is ongoingly shaped and reshaped by the historical acquisitions of the latter—as well as by its unnoticed philosophical presuppositions and its habitual abstractions. Moreover, despite their important differences, both the naturalistic attitude and the personalistic attitude fall within a more general attitude that Husserl terms the “natural attitude.” In the natural attitude, not only are we typically straightforwardly directed toward objects rather than reflecting on the structures of our own subjective experience, but entities such as “bodies” (whether these are taken as “psychophysical realities” or “embodied persons”) are given as ready-made realities within a pregiven world; even the experiencer for whom such entities are given is him/herself taken as one entity among others in the world. And the natural attitude is both all-pervasive and anonymous—it is so taken for granted that we are not even cognizant of it as an “attitude” at all. But when we do become aware of it, still further insights into embodied experience become possible.

4. The Structure of Embodied Experience

Summary: Husserl’s phenomenological investigations emphasize that the lived body functions as the central “here” from which spatial directions and distances are gauged; that it is the locus of distinctive sorts of directly felt sensations such as the experience of tactile contact; and that it is capable of self-movement, opening a rich range of practical possibilities.

Husserl’s approach to disclosing the natural attitude for what it is and suspending its wholesale, automatic efficacy is termed the phenomenological reduction, which leads us from the natural attitude of everyday life to the phenomenological attitude. Within the phenomenological attitude, we set aside questions framed in terms of an ultimate “being” or “reality” existing utterly in itself; instead, we make experiencing—and correlatively, phenomena, which means whatever is experienced, exactly as experienced—the focus of our investigations. For a phenomenology of embodiment, this means turning to the body of direct experience in a way that is even more radical than acknowledging everyday encounters with embodied persons in the personalistic attitude. Why is it more radical? It is because in everyday practical life, we are typically occupied with things and tasks, and ignore the bodily “means whereby” we perceive things and carry out our activities. Although the “anonymity” of this tacitly functioning, everyday body becomes a key theme in existential phenomenology of the body, Husserl too was well aware of it, and it was his groundbreaking research that initially retrieved this lived body and bodily experience from its anonymity.

a. The Body as a Center of Orientation

One mode of inquiry that Husserl uses in his descriptive investigations of the body of lived experience is eidetic phenomenology. The eidetic reduction—which is the shift whereby we enter the eidetic attitude—takes whatever it is that we are experiencing as but one “example of” a particular structure or possibility. (Although Husserl speaks of “essences” in this connection, his use of the term must be distinguished both from Platonic essences and from more recent concerns with “essentialism.”) Thus, for example, as I write these words, the carrots growing in my garden are to my left; later in the day, when I have moved to a different spot in the sun, the carrots will be to my right. But in each case, what I experience is not an empty, homogeneous, mathematical space; instead, I experience lived space as an oriented space whose directional axes—left/right, above/below, in front/behind—are gauged from my own lived body as the central “here” from which all there’s are “there” and from which things are relatively “near” or “far” (right now, the lettuce is “closer to me” than the carrots). One way to refer to this invariant structural feature of embodied experiencing (of which my current relation to the plants in my garden is but one of innumerable possible variations—each of us could contribute a different example, but they would all be examples “of” the same experiential structure) is to speak of the lived body as the “nullpoint of orientation.” But Husserl’s account is more nuanced than this. Although visual experience does indeed seem to proceed from a “point” somewhere in the head, behind the eyes (so that, for example, what you can see of your nose is “in front,” what you can see of your lower lid is “below,” and so on), Husserl also refers to the bodily “here” as a whole with such expressions as “null-position” and “null-posture,” so that the structure of the experiential “center” need not be point-like. And in exploring, say, the underside of my own chin and jaw with my hand, I may find that I am living in the touching hand as the functional center of orientation and experiencing what I am touching as being “above” this hand. Like all descriptive phenomenological claims, the latter claim—namely, that the functional center of orientation can vary from the central “point” from which vision proceeds—is an invitation to consult the relevant experiential evidence for yourself; is the example I have mentioned a possibility that you can actualize? Can you “find” it, experientially, immediately ... or does this structure of experience only emerge after a while, or in a different way? Spiegelberg (1966/1986/2004), for example, explores further experiential variations concerning the lived location of the embodied “center” of experiencing, and more descriptive work on this theme (especially work carried out by phenomenologists of diverse cultural backgrounds) would be welcome.

b. Distinctive Bodily Sensations

However, the lived body is more than a tacit “zero,” an abiding “here” from which spatial dimensions of perception and action unfold; it is not an abstract or empty center, but a filled one, with its own familiar feel, for to be embodied is to experience certain sorts of sensations as “mine” in a unique way. In some passages, Husserl replaces the usual German term for sensations—Empfindungen—with a new term, “Empfindnisse” (translated as “feelings” or “sensings”). Such distinctive sensitivities may be collectively referred to as the “somaesthetic” dimension of experience, including, for example, sensations felt in our bodily depths as well as on our bodily surfaces, and encompassing many nuances beyond “pleasure” and “pain.” But one of Husserl’s most important examples is tactile contact: when you touch my body, you are touching me, and I feel it. Sometimes one and the same episode of touching can be experienced in a double way: I might, for example, be exploring a small sculpture with my fingers, intent on its contours, textures, variations in temperature, and so on, or I can continue to palpate the object, but shift to an experiential attitude focused on sensing myself in contact with it precisely here, in exactly this way—retrieving the “bodily” side of my embodied commerce with the thing. Or I myself can furnish both sides of the example, touching one hand with the other (an example of Husserl’s to which Merleau-Ponty accords great importance). Here it becomes clear not only that my own body can be given to me both as the organ and as the object of touch—both as the means whereby the activity of touching is carried out, and as the phenomenon I experience through this activity (for example, the contours and textures I can feel on the surface of my touched hand)—but also that the same touched hand that is the object explored by the touching hand is itself alive to this contact, feeling it subjectively, so that I am living in this hand too as “mine.” In this connection the term “lived” body may connote a certain “undergoing,” emphasizing “affectivity” (being affected) rather than “activity” (although both are important for Husserl, who routinely mentions them together in his later research manuscripts).

c. Movement and the “I Can”

Nevertheless, actions too are “mine” (albeit in a qualitatively different way than the immediate bodily feelings of contact, pleasure, pain, warmth, cold, and so forth, are). And along with the body’s role as the center of orientation and its unique somaesthetic sensations, Husserl also emphasizes bodily motility—the capability for self-movement per se—as an essential feature of embodiment. “Being able to move” is the foundation for any specific bodily “I do” and for what he typically terms the bodily “I can” (which can be experienced as such even without actually performing the movement concerned—for instance, one can find the lived consciousness, “I can nod my head,” without actually doing it, experiencing it instead as a practical possibility given in the sheer “I could”). The range of the “I can” is enriched when I cultivate my capabilities or learn new skills, although as I have already indicated, it may also be temporarily eroded or permanently truncated in cases of illness or injury, so that the “I can” becomes an “I cannot.” For Husserl, however, the lived experience of embodied motility goes far beyond movement that is actively initiated by the I: there are also movements such as breathing, which normally goes on without my active intervention, yet can indeed be deliberately altered to some extent. Husserl therefore speaks of all such bodily movement as pertaining to the I in a broad sense that encompasses, but also includes more than, the active, awake I. For example, habitual movement patterns such as playing a familiar piece on the piano can indeed proceed without my explicit, moment by moment direction, yet are still lived as “mine,” and although they may often remain marginal, they can also be informed with awareness—or with a kind of “active allowing,” as when I lend them my “fiat” and am consciously letting the movement unfold. Thus here motility is a broader concept than agency in the strict sense whereby an “agent” would be actively, explicitly involved in initiating and directing the action throughout.

5. Kinaesthetic Consciousness


Summary: Husserl describes the articulation of kinaesthetic capabilities into coordinated systems of specific movement possibilities; outlines the “if-then” structure through which actualizing certain kinaesthetic possibilities brings coherent fields of appearances to givenness; suggests how a different “if-then” structure—one linking the deployment of my own kinaesthetic capability with the bodily feel of the movement concerned—is implicated in coming to experience other moving bodies as other sentient beings “like me”; and addresses the tension between “embodiment” as an ongoing dynamic, subjective process and the “body” as one object among others in the world.

Husserl devotes considerable attention to the theme of motility, and sketching out some of this work in more detail will allow us to see how his descriptive phenomenological work on embodiment fits into the larger philosophical context of his constitutive phenomenology (recalling that here “constitution” ultimately refers to the correlations between that which is experienced and the relevant performances and achievements of “consciousness” or “subjectivity”). Here a distinction given terminological form by one of Husserl’s assistants, Ludwig Landgrebe (1902–1991), is particularly helpful: that between the body-as-constituted and the body-as-constituting. The body-as-constituted is the body as experienced, that is, it is “that which” is experienced in the experience; the body-as-constituting is the experiencing body “by means of which” something is experienced. And for Husserl, this embodied, experiencing subjectivity (the body-as-constituting) is above all a kinaesthetic consciousness (Claesges 1964)—not as a consciousness “of” movement, but as a consciousness or subjectivity capable of movement.

a. Systems of Kinaesthetic Capabilities

Thus Husserl’s recourse to “kinaestheses” does not refer to “sense data” (for example, sensations pertaining to muscles or joints) postulated as “ingredients” of perceptual experience (for instance, of my own limbs given to me as material objects moving in space), but to the sheer experience of the subjective capability for movement per se (including the “I could” already mentioned) and to its organization into kinaesthetic systems, each with its own (multidimensional) leeway of movement possibilities. For example, in visual perception, the movement of the eyes alone forms one system; head movement affords a second system; the possibilities of rotating one’s entire body on the spot counts as a third system; and locomotor movement (for instance, walking) adds yet another system. When I turn to the left to look for the bird in the birdbath, my eye, head, and torso movements are typically vectorially combined into one integrated gesture. Turning my head allows me to see farther to my left than if eye movements alone were involved, and turning my torso expands my view beyond what eye and head movements can offer together—but whatever combination of eye, head, and torso movements is swung into play when I hear the splash in the birdbath, “turning to the left” will eventually allow me to bring what initially appeared only at (or beyond) the left-hand periphery of the visual field into the center of the field. Kinaesthetic systems can also stand in for one another—if my arms are full, I may hold the door open with my hip or acknowledge a friend’s wave with a gesture of my head rather than my hand. In this way the interarticulated kinaesthetic systems work together as one total kinaesthetic system whose multifarious possibilities of coordination typically take on the more circumscribed form of a habitual repertoire of familiar movement possibilities and customary ways to move.

Even within this more limited leeway, however, motility is characterized by a certain essential freedom that can be contrasted with the physical motion of spatial objects. This by no means implies complete freedom in every case—once I jump off the diving board, it is too late to change my mind, and I am headed for the water, since—unlike a bird—I have no way to fly back up into the sky. But the lived motility in which kinaesthetic consciousness holds sway is more typically experienced as reversible: having turned my head to the left, I can turn it back to the right; having extended my hand, I can withdraw it; having gone in one direction, I can retrace my steps. Moreover, the lived movement can be not only reversed, but repeated, interrupted, and inhibited; for Husserl, even “holding still” is a dynamic event, since it involves ongoingly maintaining a certain kinaesthetic “constellation” or “situation.”

b. Kinaesthetic Capabilities and Perceptual Appearances

Such descriptions retrieve kinaesthetic functioning from its anonymity, but remain abstract as long as its constitutive role is not specified more precisely. For example, enacting certain kinaesthetic possibilities brings certain correlative perceptual appearances to givenness in a concordant, regulated, non-arbitrary manner. “From here” I can see “this side” of the house, but this side already promises more, a situation for which Husserl uses the technical terms “inner horizon” and “outer horizon.” The current appearance of this side points to an inner horizon of possible future perceptions in which this very same side would itself be more fully given—for instance, if I were to move closer, then it could be touched as well as seen, or what is currently seen indistinctly could be seen in more detail, and so on. But “this” side of the building also points to an outer horizon of possible future perceptions of other “sides,” as well as further features of the surroundings, including currently unseen sides of other objects in the background, and so on.

Here what is important is not merely that Husserl’s account of perception emphasizes a correlation between, on the one hand, an embodied perceiver functioning as a center of orientation and, on the other hand, the perspectivity that is the invariable mode of givenness of perceived things in space; rather, what is at stake is a coherent, explorable, transcendent, open world. In other words, it is not merely that I see things from my own standpoint: it is that my own motility is the subjective correlate both of the world’s open explorability—its transcendence “beyond” the aspect of it given at any moment—and of its concordant coherence, since if I enact the appropriate kinaesthetic sequences, then what is currently “emptily” predelineated can be “fulfilled” in itself-givenness of the anticipated side or feature concerned (or can be “disappointed” and corrected instead). For example, I see a “corner” of the house; inseparable from the experience of this as a “corner” is that there is “more” to the house to be seen “around the corner” (even if this “more” is as yet indeterminate), and “if” I move there, “then” I will see precisely this “more,” determine its features in more detail, and so forth (or perhaps discover that all that is left of the building is a facade). However, the “if-then” relation that is at stake here is not a causal one, since the correlations in question pertain to the ordered structure of experience purely as experienced, not to real relations between physical entities considered in the naturalistic attitude (an attitude that we are, of course, free to take up if we wish).

Within the phenomenological attitude, in other words, the point is not to establish causal relations between “turning my head to the left” and “seeing a birdbath”; instead, the horizon of freedom pertaining to kinaesthetic consciousness opens ordered fields of display that can be seamlessly expanded as I move, so that turning my head to the left allows the corresponding further stretch of the visible world to come into view, whatever there may in fact be for me to see in any given situation or on any given occasion. And the same fundamental correlation between kinaesthetic capabilities and coherent fields of spatial display holds good for movement in any direction, as well as for the intersensorial world. Thus the description identifies an essential structure of experience per se, rather than offering a causal explanation of a particular empirical/factual event. Moreover, it turns out that Husserl’s analyses are not confined to the kinaesthetic circumstances swung into play in experiencing individual transcendent things “in” space, but demonstrate that kinaesthetic consciousness is itself space-constituting. (Early extensive analyses are found in the 1907 lectures published in Thing and Space, but Husserl refined his account throughout his life.) This, then, is another example of a Husserlian critique of presuppositions: he does not naively assume “space” as a pregiven framework for embodied perception and action (for example, as some kind of ready-made “container”), but devotes many pages to the experiential evidence that is at stake in the givenness of various types or levels of “space,” including not only the most immediate, “preobjective” space, but the infinite and homogeneous space of the natural sciences.

c. Kinaesthetic Experience and the Experience of Others

At this point, a second set of analyses come into play, for it is a feature of lived embodiment that I cannot jump out of my own skin and walk around myself in order to survey myself from all sides: the seeing consciousness is always at the center of orientation, and although I may be able to see parts of myself from various angles, I cannot see myself as a whole, as a figure on a ground or as an object “over there” from which I could definitively move away. Instead, I function as the uncancellably abiding “here” from which space-perception invariably proceeds. This means, however, that my “solo” experience of situated motility leaves me with a “hole” in space wherever I go—a mobile but non-surveyable center around which the rest of the panorama unfolds. The constitution of a genuinely homogeneous, objective, three-dimensional space requires the contribution of others, for whom I myself am indeed “over there,” inhabiting one among many possible “there’s.”  Thus space-constitution is tied up with the Husserlian theme of intersubjectivity, which is also a key motif in his phenomenology of embodiment. Although Husserl gives various accounts of intersubjectivity, the present article pulls together some pieces of the puzzle that depend directly on his work with kinaesthetic consciousness. Note, however, that this account is not a linear account of discrete “steps” to be carried out, as though we began our existence utterly alone and only gradually discovered fellow living beings; rather, the explication furnishes a kind of “exploded diagram” of certain structural moments involved in the lived experience of recognizing embodied others—here construed broadly enough to encompass non-human as well as human cases. (Thus in the technical language of phenomenology, the “exploded diagram” account is “static,” rather than providing a “genetic” description of the origin and development of a certain type of experience as an abiding acquisition.)

For Husserl, a double dimension of “localization” of kinaestheses comes into play in this regard (always recalling that here the term “kinaesthetic” refers to motility per se, to the sheer “I can”/“I could” rather than to specific sorts of “sense data”). First of all, it is possible for at least some enactments of my own directly experienced motility to be co-given to me in the form of something perceivable in the same way as things of the world are. Thus, for example, not only can I move my own limbs, but—within limits—I can see them as moving objects in the same field of vision where other spatial things are given: subjective motility is “localized” in objectively appearing movements displaying certain distinctive styles of movement and modes of relating to the surrounding world (think, for example, of my own active/responsive hands being visible to me as I reach for an object and grasp it). Similarly, the kinaesthetic experience of speaking, singing, or crying out is paired with sounds appearing in the same audial field in which other sounds are given. (Although what I am providing here is, as I have indicated, a structural explication of intersubjectivity rather than a genetic-developmental account, it should be pointed out that in one brief passage on the mother-child relationship, Husserl emphasizes the child linking his/her own kinaesthetic capability for vocalization with certain heard sounds in the audial sphere in general—and then hearing sounds resembling these in certain respects, but without simultaneously experiencing the relevant kinaestheses, so that this contrast mediates the emerging own/other distinction.) But at the same time, enacting this or that kinaesthetic possibility (or constellation of possibilities) from the total kinaesthetic horizon yields yet another “if-then” order, above and beyond the coherent correlations discussed above whereby kinaesthetic circumstances motivate corresponding perceptual appearances. For “if” I move in a certain way, “then” even without touching myself, I can experience correlative somaesthetic sensations or sensings (Empfindnisse): kinaesthetic enactments are “localized” in corresponding patterns of felt embodiment (for instance, experiences of straining or releasing) through which my own lived body is concretely, sensuously present for me (whether marginally, as when I am immersed in something I am reading, or thematically—think, for example, of how it feels to stretch luxuriously).

To put it another way, the “mineness” of my own act of moving is linked with the “mineness” of the accompanying somaesthetic sensations, as well as with recognizable styles of externally perceivable movement. When I perceive movement in such a style, then, but without the correlative kinaesthetic consciousness (the tacit or explicit “I move”) and its accompanying patterns of felt somaesthetic localization, I experience (via what Husserl terms “passive syntheses of association”—which, however, must not be confused with “associationistic” psychological theories) another subjectivity who, like me, is a subject of both action and affection, both agency and ownership, both doing and undergoing. Thus it is not necessary to see another body that looks the same as mine in the sense of being roughly the same size, shape, and color in order to motivate the experience of recognizing the other’s subjectivity—in fact, the view of myself “from the outside” that this would require is precisely something that I can never fully have: it is a possibility that is itself motivated from the experience of the other as having his/her own point of view on me, and thus cannot serve to motivate my recognition of the other as another subjectivity in the first place. Instead, what I experience when I see the other stands at a higher degree of universality: I see a style of movement associated with certain eidetic features proper to sentient/sensitive motility per se, namely, kinaesthetic capability and somaesthetic sensibility. But exactly because these invariants are open to exemplification in so many ways, they provide the foundation for the lived experience of difference-from-the-other as well as that of similarity-with-the-other, since they are the very identity that permits the experience of “difference” here at all.

I do not, in other words, recognize others because I see them as reiterations of myself in my concrete embodiment; the I-other pairing does not consist of a model and a replica, but of two mutually contrasting variations of “embodiment per se,” only one of which I have genuinely original access to (when I pick up the heavy stone, I experience both my own effort and the stone’s resistance firsthand; seeing the other struggle with the stone, I may understand the degree of effort involved and realize that I am the stronger of the two of us, but I do not experience the other’s effort in the same direct way I experience my own, nor do I directly experience the other’s pain if the stone slips and lands on the other’s toe). Thus the other active, sentient, sensitive, relational body is not some sort of duplicate of my own body, but precisely “a” lived body lived from an experiential standpoint I myself can never inhabit, a “here” that is truly transcendent to my own precisely because I inevitably experience it as a “there” in paired contrast to my own “here.”

d. Further Philosophical Issues

So far, I have sketched out how embodiment understood as kinaesthetic consciousness functions in Husserl’s philosophical accounts of the transcendent spatial world and transcendent fellow subjectivities. Here it is not possible to flesh out these accounts in any more detail, although it can be said that for Husserl, our very openness to the world essentially involves a kinaesthetic engagement with what is most immediately, sensuously given in such a way that the genetic origins of transcendental logic itself can be traced back to these kinaesthetic capabilities and performances and their correlative sensuous “givens” (see Husserliana 11), matters he thematizes under the title of “transcendental aesthetics” (although he takes this term in a different sense than Kant’s). However, a further step must at least be touched on, one that draws upon yet another important distinction—that between the transcendental and the mundane. Husserl’s analyses of kinaesthetic consciousness assume a transcendental attitude, yet in the natural attitude, the body is—as we have seen—“obviously” a mundane reality, a part of the world. Although his earlier efforts were geared toward clarifying the philosophical foundations of the sciences that study such a reality, some of his later writings (see, for example, Husserliana 15, 282–328, 648–57) are framed as an inquiry into the experiential achievements whereby transcendental consciousness “mundanizes” itself in the first place (that is, takes itself as part of the world), even prior to “naturalizing” itself in psychophysical terms. Without going into detail about his approach to the problem (which is also known as the paradox of subjectivity—how can the very consciousness that constitutes the world simultaneously be a part of this world?), it should be emphasized that for Husserl, what is at stake is ultimately not at all how a “disembodied” consciousness could somehow acquire a “body.” Instead, after demonstrating that kinaesthetic capability is an essential structural moment of transcendental subjectivity itself, he asks how kinaesthetic consciousness as an ongoing flow of purely experiential potentialities (the possibilities of primal motility per se), and of ever-changing actualizations of these possibilities, can come to count as a mundane entity apprehended as one thing among others in the world (and here Husserl’s descriptions of the lived experience of “resistance” offer important clues). In any case, however, the Husserlian critique of presuppositions concerning the body leads to something like the possibility of transcendental corporeality—a notion that places many aspects of the Western philosophical tradition itself into question.

6. Conclusion

Recognizing the tension between the transcendental experience of embodiment as kinaesthetic consciousness (or indeed, of “consciousness” or “subjectivity” as kinaesthetic) on the one hand and the mundane experience of the body as a material, psychophysical reality on the other can now allow us to summarize two of Husserl’s most important contributions to a phenomenology of embodiment (above and beyond his pioneering descriptions of essential features of bodily subjectivity). First, taken transcendentally, embodiment is not something accomplished once and for all, but is—to borrow a telling phrase from Zaner’s The Problem of Embodiment (1964)—“a continuously on-going act”: at every moment (even during periods of relative quiescence), I am involved in a dynamic process of “embodying” that is carried out through the current actualization of my own kinaesthetic capabilities, with certain possibilities rather than others being actualized in this or that way. This is the case whether the particular kinaestheses swung into play at any given moment arise from instinctual strivings, involuntary adjustments, acquired habits, or volitionally directed free movement, and whether these patterns of kinaesthetic actualization are going completely unnoticed; are marginally present for me; are experientially prominent due to difficulty or discomfort; or are consciously appreciated in lucid awareness “from within” (note that these two sets of possibilities—one having to do with volition, the other with awareness—can intersect in a number of ways). Second, that I can apprehend myself as a “psychophysical unity” is not simply something to be naively accepted, but something to be clarified as a historical achievement whereby embodied experience is localized in a mundane object, “the body,” as one item among others in a world of material, natural realities. Thus within the natural attitude, “embodiment” winds up signifying the external expression of the inwardness always already essentially pertaining to “bodies” insofar as they are lived bodies (as opposed to mere physical things). And indeed, experiential evidence for the latter sense of “embodiment” is readily available in everyday life in our times—we immediately encounter one another as embodied persons, not as machines that we suspect or conclude must harbor minds. However, experiencing myself as an ongoing realization of my own kinaesthetic capabilities taken not “psychophysically,” but sheerly experientially (which deactivates, rather than presupposing, mind-body dualism) requires shifting from the mundane to the transcendental attitude (in Husserl’s sense of the term “transcendental”), although once this insight has been historically achieved, it too, like the achievements of naturalism, can “flow back into” everyday experience.

In the end, then, whether he is providing a phenomenological genealogy of the “psychophysical” or offering an alternative account of embodiment in terms of “kinaesthetic consciousness,” Husserl provides a powerful critique of Cartesian dualism. Nevertheless, his own interests are basically epistemological in character: the accent lies not on claims about what the body really “is,” but on the epistemic contribution of embodiment itself to our knowledge of the world in the first place (as well as on the legitimacy of the foundations of our knowledge of such matters). And as in all of his phenomenological work, Husserl does not merely “hold a position” and offer arguments to support it, but consistently and rigorously takes the ultimate court of appeal to be the experiential evidence pertaining to the phenomena themselves—evidence that continually outruns our inherited terms and concepts and requires us to place them in question.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Husserl, Edmund. Ding und Raum. Vorlesungen 1907. Ed. Ulrich Claesges. Husserliana 16. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973; Thing and Space: Lectures of 1907. Trans. Richard Rojcewicz. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997, Sections IV–VI (129–245).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie. Zweites Buch. Phänomenologische Untersuchungen zur Konstitution [1912]. Ed. Marly Biemel. Husserliana 4. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1952; Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy. Second Book. Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution. Trans. Richard Rojcewicz and André Schuwer. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1989, especially §§18a–b (60–70), §§36–42 (152–69), §§59–60a (266–77), et passim.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie. Drittes Buch. Die Phänomenologie und die Fundamente der Wissenschaften [1912]. Ed. Marly Biemel. Husserliana 5. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1952; Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy. Third Book. Phenomenology and the Foundations of the Sciences. Trans. Ted E. Klein and William E. Pohl. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1980, §2 (4–9); Supplement I, §4 (103–12).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Analysen zur passiven Synthesis. Aus Vorlesungs- und Forschungsmanuskripten 1918–1926. Ed. Margot Fleischer. Husserliana 11. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966; Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic. Trans. Anthony J. Steinbock. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001, §3 (47–53); “Perception and its Process of Self-Giving,” §2 (581–88); Appendix 25 (534–36).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Phänomenologische Psychologie. Vorlesungen Sommersemester 1925. Ed. Walter Biemel. Husserliana 9. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1962, Beilage VIII (“Die somatologische Struktur der objektiven Welt,” 390–95, not translated);Phenomenological Psychology: Lectures, Summer Semester, 1925. Trans. John Scanlon. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1977, §15 (79–83), §21 (99–101), §39 (150–53).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Cartesianische Meditationen [1931] und Pariser Vorträge. Ed. Stephan Strasser. Husserliana 1. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1950; Cartesian Meditations: An Introduction to Phenomenology. Trans. Dorion Cairns. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1960, Fifth Meditation, especially §44 (92–99), §§51–56 (112–31).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Die Krisis der europäischen Wissenschaften und die transzendentale Phänomenologie. Eine Einleitung in die phänomenologische Philosophie [1936]. Ed. Walter Biemel. Husserliana 6. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1954; The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy. Trans. David Carr. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1970, §28 (103–11), §47 (161–64), §62 (215–19).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivität. Texte aus dem Nachlass. Erster Teil: 1905–1920; Zweiter Teil: 1921–1928; Dritter Teil: 1929–1935. Ed. Iso Kern. Husserliana 13, 14, 15. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973, passim.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Transzendentaler Idealismus. Texte aus dem Nachlass (1908–1921). Ed. Robin D. Rollinger with Rochus Sowa. Husserliana 36. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2003, Text Nr. 7 (132–45), Text Nr. 9 (151–66).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Die Lebenswelt. Auslegungen der vorgegebenen Welt und ihrer Konstitution. Texte aus dem Nachlass (1916–1937). Ed. Rochus Sowa. Husserliana 39. Dordrecht: Springer, 2008, especially Part IX (603–672).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Behnke, Elizabeth A. “Edmund Husserl’s Contribution to Phenomenology of the Body in Ideas II” [1989]. Rpt. in Issues in Husserl’s “Ideas II.” Ed. Thomas Nenon and Lester Embree. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1996, 135–60; rev. in Phenomenology: Critical Concepts in Philosophy. Ed. Dermot Moran and Lester E. Embree with Tanja Staehler and Elizabeth A. Behnke. Volume 2. Phenomenology: Themes and Issues. London: Routledge, 2004, 235–64 [includes further references to work in this area].
  • Bernet, Rudolf, Iso Kern, and Eduard Marbach. Edmund Husserl. Darstellung seines Denkens [1989]. 2nd rev. ed. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1996; An Introduction to Husserlian Phenomenology. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1993, Chapter 4, §3 (“The Kinaesthetic Motivation in the Constitution of Thing and Space,” 130–40, 259–60); Chapter 5, §2 (“Our Experience of the Other,” 154–65, 261–62).
  • Claesges, Ulrich. Edmund Husserls Theorie der Raumkonstitution. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1964, Parts II and III (55–144) [includes significant citations on lived body and kinaesthetic consciousness from Husserl’s D manuscripts].
  • Depraz, Natalie. Lucidité du corps. De l’empirisme transcendantal en phénoménologie. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001.
  • Dodd, James. Idealism and Corporeity: An Essay on the Problem of the Body in Husserl’s Phenomenology. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997.
  • Mohanty, J. N. “Intentionality and the Mind/Body Problem.” In Organism, Medicine, and Metaphysics: Essays in Honor of Hans Jonas. Ed. Stuart F. Spicker. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1978, 283–300; rpt. in his The Possibility of Transcendental Philosophy. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff, 1985, 121–38; rpt. in Phenomenology: Critical Concepts in Philosophy. Ed. Dermot Moran and Lester E. Embree with Tanja Staehler and Elizabeth A. Behnke. Volume 2. Phenomenology: Themes and Issues. London: Routledge, 2004, 316–32.
  • Sawicki, Marianne. Body, Text, and Science: The Literacy of Investigative Practices and the Phenomenology of Edith Stein. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997, Chapter 2, D (“Nature and Intellect in Ideen II,” 73–89); Chapter 4, B, 1 (“Stein’s work for Husserl,” 153–65).
  • Seebohm, Thomas M. Hermeneutics: Method and Methodology. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2004, §12 (“The givenness of the other living body and animal understanding,” 98–105).
  • Spiegelberg, Herbert. “On the Motility of the Ego.” In Conditio Humana: Erwin W. Straus on his 75th birthday. Ed. Walter von Baeyer and Richard M. Griffith. Berlin: Springer-Verlag, 1966, 289–306; rpt., with Postscript 1978, in Spiegelberg, Steppingstones toward an Ethics for Fellow Existers: Essays 1944–1983. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff, 1986, 65–86; rpt. in Phenomenology: Critical Concepts in Philosophy. Ed. Dermot Moran and Lester E. Embree with Tanja Staehler and Elizabeth A. Behnke. Volume 2. Phenomenology: Themes and Issues. London: Routledge, 2004, 217–34.
  • Ströker, Elisabeth. Philosophische Untersuchungen zum Raum. Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1965; Investigations in Philosophy of Space. Trans. Algis Mickunas. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press, 1987, Part One (“Lived Space,” 13–172).
  • Zahavi, Dan. “Husserl’s Phenomenology of the Body.” Études Phénoménologiques No. 19 (1994), 63–84.
  • Zaner, Richard M. The Problem of Embodiment: Some Contributions to a Phenomenology of the Body. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1964, 249–61, 287–89.


Author Information

Elizabeth A. Behnke
U. S. A.

Edmund Husserl (1859—1938)

HusserlAlthough not the first to coin the term, it is uncontroversial to suggest that the German philosopher, Edmund Husserl (1859-1938), is the "father" of the philosophical movement known as phenomenology.  Phenomenology can be roughly described as the sustained attempt to describe experiences (and the "things themselves") without metaphysical and theoretical speculations. Husserl suggested that only by suspending or bracketing away the "natural attitude" could philosophy becomes its own distinctive and rigorous science, and he insisted that phenomenology is a science of consciousness rather than of empirical things. Indeed, in Husserl’s hands phenomenology began as a critique of both psychologism and naturalism.  Naturalism is the thesis that everything belongs to the world of nature and can be studied by the methods appropriate to studying that world (that is, the methods of the hard sciences). Husserl argued that the study of consciousness must actually be very different from the study of nature. For him, phenomenology does not proceed from the collection of large amounts of data and to a general theory beyond the data itself, as in the scientific method of induction. Rather, it aims to look at particular examples without theoretical presuppositions (such as the phenomena of intentionality, of love, of two hands touching each other, and so forth), before then discerning what is essential and necessary to these experiences. Although all of the key, subsequent phenomenologists (Heidegger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, Gadamer, Levinas, Derrida) have contested aspects of Husserl’s characterization of phenomenology, they have nonetheless been heavily indebted to him. As such, he is arguably one of the most important and influential philosophers of the twentieth century. The key features of his work, and his understanding of the phenomenological method, are considered in what follows.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. How to Interpret Husserl's Texts
  3. On the Concept of Number (Übert den Begriff der Zahl, 1887)
  4. Logical Investigations (Logische Untersuchungen, 1900-01)
  5. Ideas I (Ideen I, 1913)
  6. Ideas II (Ideen II)
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Edmund Husserl was born April 8, 1859, into a Jewish family in the town of Prossnitz in Moravia, then a part of the Austrian Empire. Although there was a Jewish technical school in the town, Edmund's father, a clothing merchant, had the means and the inclination to send the boy away to Vienna at the age of 10 to begin his German classical education in the Realgymnasium of the capital. A year later, in 1870, Edmund transferred to the Staatsgymnasium in Olmütz, closer to home. He was remembered there as a mediocre student who nevertheless loved mathematics and science, "of blond and pale complexion, but of good appetite." He graduated in 1876 and went to Leipzig for university studies.

At Leipzig Husserl studied mathematics, physics, and philosophy, and he was particularly intrigued with astronomy and optics. After two years he went to Berlin in 1878 for further studies in mathematics. He completed that work in Vienna, 1881-83, and received the doctorate with a dissertation on the theory of the calculus of variations. He was 24. Husserl briefly held an academic post in Berlin, then returned again to Vienna in 1884 and was able to attend Franz Brentano's lectures in philosophy.

In 1886 he went to Halle, where he studied psychology and wrote his Habilitationsschrift on the concept of number. He also was baptized. The next year he became Privatdozent at Halle and married a woman from the Prossnitz Jewish community, Malvine Charlotte Steinschneider, who was baptized before the wedding. The couple had three children. They remained at Halle until 1901, and Husserl wrote his important early books there. The Habilitationsschrift was reworked into the first part of Philosophie der Arithmetik, published in 1891. The two volumes of Logische Untersuchungen came out in 1900 and 1901.

In 1901 Husserl joined the faculty at Göttingen, where he taught for 16 years and where he worked out the definitive formulations of his phenomenology that are presented in Ideen zu einer reinen Ph‰nomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie (Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy). The first volume of Ideen appeared in the first volume of Husserl's Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung in 1913. Then the world war disrupted the circle of Husserl's younger colleagues, and Wolfgang Husserl, his son, died at Verdun. Husserl observed a year of mourning and kept silence professionally during that time.

However Husserl accepted appointment in 1916 to a professorship at Freiburg im Breisgau, a position from which he would retire in 1928. At Freiburg Husserl continued to work on manuscripts that would be published after his death as volumes two and three of the Ideen, as well as on many other projects. His retirement from teaching in 1928 did not slow the pace of his phenomenological research. But his last years were saddened by the escalation of National Socialism's racist policies against Jews. He died of pleurisy in 1938, on Good Friday, reportedly as a Christian.

Most commentators, therefore, recognize three periods in Husserl's career: the work at Halle, Göttingen, and Freiburg, respectively. Some argue that one or another of these periods ought to be taken as definitive and used as the interpretive key to unlock the others. But such an approach highlights disjunctions in Husserl's thought while neglecting the significant continuities. Important strands of Husserl's philosophy have their beginning long before his academic career commenced.

The community into which Husserl was born, Prossnitz, was a center of talmudic learning whose yeshiva had produced or welcomed a number of famous rabbis during the two centuries before Husserl's birth. This scholarly activity was supported by the industries of textile and clothing manufacture, through which Prossnitz's Jews had enhanced the prosperity of the region. Jews and Germans were minorities in the town and appear to have comprised its middle class. Their interests were naturally allied against those of the Slavic majority. (For example, the census of 1900 counted 1,680 Jews among the town's 24,000 inhabitants, according to The Jewish Encyclopedia.) In the ethnically diverse town, several dialects were spoken, and the language of the Husserl home probably was Yiddish.

The Jewish community of Prossnitz had established a technical school in 1843, and it became a public school for all the town's children in 1869--one year before young Edmund Husserl was sent off to Vienna's Realgymnasium. 1868 was also a year when civic authorities called for reform of Jewish education at all levels throughout Moravia. These developments reflect a movement toward modernization and integration after centuries of enforced segregation and legal restriction of Jewish life.

Prossnitz was the second-largest Jewish community in Moravia, with 328 families. Exactly 328 families; it could have no more, because of the quota established by the Bohemian Familianten Gesetz in 1787. The Jewish population was controlled through marriage licenses. Civil law set specific economic, age, and educational requirements; but in addition, the license could be granted only after a death freed up one of the allotted 328 slots. In effect, only first sons could hope to marry. Others had to emigrate if they wanted to have families of their own. This population-control policy was enforced until 1849, ten years before Edmund Husserl's birth. The requirement that Jews obtain special marriage licenses remained in effect until late in 1859, some months after Edmund's birth.

But Edmund Husserl's childhood was spent during an era of liberalization for Prossnitz's Jews. He received an elite secular education and probably made his father quite proud. At that period, gymnasia provided separate religious instruction for Christian boys and Jewish boys. Edmund's Jewish education would have continued in that context and in the language of secular culture, High German. He could hear and read the Bible in that modern language as well, for in the nineteenth century a wave of new translations into the language of German culture was spawned by Moses Mendelssohn's groundbreaking work. (Mendelssohn's 1783 translation into High German was printed in Hebrew characters, phonetically, to make it easy to read.) Some of these editions were lavishly illustrated for display in bourgeois homes like Edmund's, and most took into account the findings of recent historical and philological science. But during Edmund's childhood, translating the Hebrew Bible was still a controversial issue. Some educational leaders in the Jewish community warned that it would undermine Hebrew learning among the young. Hebrew learning was evidently not prized by a father who would send his son to the capital to study Greek and Latin at the age when boys traditionally were sent down the street to learn Hebrew and Torah. To complicate the picture, in 1870 when Edmund was eleven, a new rabbi came to serve the Prossnitz community.

One may surmise, then, that Edmund Husserl came by his knowledge of the Bible through his classical secular education, not his religious tradition. It was of a piece with the German cultural heritage for him. It was a source of literary allusions, and in later life he could compare himself to Moses and to Sisyphus with equal ease.

Literary allusions, along with fragments of correspondence, are all that remain to us for the reconstruction of what Husserl may have felt about himself and his work. There is no autobiography per se. But there are retrospective texts. One of the most illuminating is the brief introduction that Husserl prepared for the 1931 publication in English of the first book of Ideen, originally brought out in 1913.

Now in his seventies, Husserl complains that most readers have misunderstood his life's work. When he undertakes to reformulate what phenomenology is and what he has accomplished, however, he writes from a vantage point that he did not have some two decades earlier. Husserl becomes, in effect, a critic and interpreter of his own work, which he describes with a sustained metaphor. He portrays himself as an explorer who has opened the way into new territory so that others may conquer, map, and farm it. Of himself, Husserl writes:

"(H)e who for decades did not speculate about a new Atlantis but instead actually journeyed in the trackless wilderness of a new continent and undertook the virgin cultivation of some of its areas will not allow himself to be deterred in any way by the rejection of geographers who judge his reports according to their habitual ways of experiencing and thinking and thereby excuse themselves from the pain of undertaking travels in the new land" (422)

Here is another example of this characterization:

I can see spread out before me the endlessly open plains of true philosophy, the 'promised land', though its thorough cultivation will come after me" (429)

By means of this spatial, geographical metaphor of crossing over into the "new land," Husserl conveys something of the adventure and pioneer courage that should accompany phenomenological work. This science is related to "a new field of experience, exclusively its own, the field of 'transcendental subjectivity'," and it offers "a method of access to the transcendental-phenomenological sphere" (408). Husserl is the "first explorer" (419) of this marvelous place.

2. How to Interpret Husserl's Texts

Husserl had already employed the spatial metaphor in the 1913 text, although without explicit reference to himself as explorer. In chapter I-1 of Ideen I he had distinguished states of affairs (Sachverhaltnis) from essences (Wesen) by assigning them to two "spheres": the factual or material, and the formal or eidetic, respectively. These spheres are connected only by the mind's ability to pass between them as easily as moving around within either of them; they do not connect on their own, as it were. That is, no causality obtains between them. "Movement between" and "movement within" are of course further elaborations upon the spatial metaphor, and serve to designate the ability of consciousness to flow along, concentrate itself, linger, combine, focus, or disperse as it will. Such acts of consciousness belong to these spheres. They are worldly. They are "psychological."

Husserl's task is to get from those spheres into another "field" that is quite unlike them. It will be the sphere of absolute consciousness, consciousness when it isn't going anywhere. As the title of chapter II-3 puts it, this will be "The Region of Pure Consciousness." You can't "go there" with consciousness; instead you have to let the worldly go away and then inhabit what's left. This is the import of the infamous fantasy that opens paragraph 33: "(W)as kann als Sein noch setzbar sein, wenn das Weltall, das All der Realit‰t eingeklammert bleibt?" (In Kersten's paraphrase: "What can remain, if the whole world, including ourselves with all our cogitare, is excluded?" [63])

Now, it's quite curious that Husserl should choose the spatial metaphor to introduce and induce his phenomenological reduction. This metaphor invites confusion for anyone familiar with Descartes-- who after all named spatial extension as the substantial attribute of material being. None of Husserl's "spheres" is literally extended, in the Cartesian sense; yet all are coextensive (coincident) with material being--inasmuch as there's literally nowhere else besides the material universe where they could be. Why then should Husserl choose such an incongruous and counterproductive metaphor? A different metaphor (such as "fabric" or "organism," for example) could have conveyed the notions of coherence, separation, and access that Husserl intended. What is distinctive about the spatial metaphor, however, is that it connotes exploration and conquest. If transcendental consciousness is a promised land, then you need a Moses to lead you toward it. You need Husserl. When Husserl remarks, in the 1931 Introduction, that he can look down across that land that he has discovered, but that others will enter, this is a literary allusion to the figure of Moses, who led his people to Canaan, "the promised land," but did not lead them into it (Deuteronomy 34).

If these allusions from 1931 can be taken as a thumbnail self- portrait, still one must remember that it was sketched during Husserl's retirement. But Husserl's thought grew and changed throughout his long career. In his maturity, the philosopher joined his readers in producing commentary upon his youthful work. The three phases of Husserl's career--Halle, Göttingen, and Freiburg--invite facile divisions, and decisive turning points have been suggested within each of those periods. (The survival of nearly 45,000 pages of stenographic notes from Husserl's teaching and his private researches has fueled disputes about when he might have had the first glimmer of a thought that led to a lecture comment that led to a paragraph that found its way into a book published long after the man's papers and ashes were shelved in Louvain!)

Husserl himself insisted that the threads of continuity throughout the evolution of his thought were more significant than any false starts that later had to be repudiated. It seems well to grant him this point. Yet on two issues one must take seriously the critical discussion arising from disjunctions in Husserl's thought: (a) the question whether to characterize Husserl as realist or idealist, and (b) the question of which stage of Husserl's evolution--if any--should be taken as the definitive version through which all other versions are to be read. Husserl himself, writing as his own critic later in life, took a position on each of those issues. On (a), he insisted that he was and always had meant to be a transcendental idealist. On (b), he claimed competence to correct the insights of 1887, 1900, and 1913 with the insights of the 1920's and 1930's. Thus the mature Husserl would wish to erase the impression that his early work resolved the realism-idealism conundrum in favor of realism, and that it did so in fidelity to an insight already expressed in his earliest work on number.

Various punctuations of Husserl's career by time, place, and predominant question have been suggested by commentators (for example, Kockelmans 1967: 17-23; Ricoeur 1967: 3-12; Biemel 1970; and Bell 1990). Husserl's phenomenology developed gradually, but there were several relatively sudden turns and several stalls. Two examples suffice to illustrate. While at Halle shortly after the publication of Philosophie der Arithmetik, Husserl distanced himself from his recent efforts to establish mathematical and logical principles upon the psychological operations of the mind—a project that he later termed "psychologism." Many commentators have characterized this as an abrupt turn made in response to Frege's effective criticism of Philosophie der Arithmetik. However Mohanty (1982: 13), who examines the Frege-Husserl correspondence along with other documentary evidence, concludes to the contrary, that:

the seeds of development of Husserl's philosophy from the Philosophie der Arithmetik to the Prolegomena [i.e., the first volume of the Logische Untersuchungen, 1900] were immanent to his own thinking, so that the hypothesis of a traumatic effect of Frege's 1894 review of his book and a consequent reversal of his mode of thinking is not only uncalled for but also unsubstantiated by the available evidence.

Mohanty, then, provides ample warrant for a reading of Husserl that pursues threads of continuity between his early mathematical work and the breakthrough to phenomenology while at Halle.

In a second example of a supposed disjuncture in Husserl's development, there has been discussion of whether he changed his stance from realism to idealism between Göttingen and Freiburg. On the one hand, Eugen Fink (1933) and many others see a consistent evolution of transcendental idealism from the work published in Ideen I onward. They tend either to dismiss the earlier works as if they were merely youthful failures, or forcibly to harmonize the realist passages with Husserl's later positions. Husserl himself endorsed such a reading. On the other hand, those who studied with Husserl at Göttingen insist that his work at that time had validity and integrity in its own right. His former student Edith Stein (1932: 44-45) remarks that Husserl's disciples were surprised at the idealistic passages in Ideen, and she calls Fink a latecomer to Husserl's phenomenology. One of Stein's contemporaries among Husserl students, Roman Ingarden (1962: 159), says that:

the idealistic tendencies apparent in volume I of the Ideen had been opposed by his disciples when the work was being studied during the seminars at Göttingen and . . . his disciples pointed out many passages in the Ideen which seemed to contain direct arguments against his idealism.

Subsequently Ingarden presented arguments, based on both the text of Logische Untersuchungen and his conversations with Husserl, in support of the view that Husserl originally espoused a realist standpoint but later abandoned it (Ingarden 1975: 4-8). Further discussion of the issue is to be found in Kockelmans (1967: 418-449) and in Van de Pitte (1981: 36-42)--who suggests that the discrepancy will vanish if one reads Husserl's idealism as an epistemological or methodological approach to a metaphysically real world.

For his own part, Husserl (1931: 418-9) claimed that his transcendental idealism had advanced altogether beyond ordinary idealism, beyond realism, and beyond the very distinction between them. He denied that he ever had held a realist position:

. . . I still consider, as I did before, every form of the usual philosophical realism nonsensical in principle, no less so than that idealism which it sets itself up against in its arguments and which it "refutes." [Phenomenological reduction] is a piece of pure self- reflection, exhibiting the most original evident facts; moreover, if it brings into view in them the outlines of idealism . .. it is still anything but a party to the usual debates bewteen idealism and realism. . . .

Husserl argued that transcendental-phenomenological idealism did not deny the actual existence of the real world, but sought instead to clarify the sense of this world (which everyone accepts) as actually existing.

Thus Husserl joins the company of those who read his work "backwards," from the standpoint of Freiburg, interpreting the earliest work in light of the transcendental idealism of the latest. This reading grants no validity to the earlier work in its own right. It sets Husserl against Kant, and phenomenology's thoroughgoing idealism against Kantian critical idealism. Fink, in his detailed response to neo- Kantians' readings of Husserl's phenomenology (1932), scolds them for even addressing arguments made in Husserl's 1900-1 and 1913 publications--for Fink contends that those positions now must be assimilated to Husserl's later formulations. The extreme hermeneutical implications of this stance come clear in Fink's delineation of the threefold paradox entailed in reading Husserl's phenomenology: (1) It is inevitably misunderstood if the reader has not first cultivated the transcendental attitude; yet that attitude arises from the reading. (2) The words necessarily miss their meaning, and fail to refer effectively to the pre-worldly realm of transcendental subjectivity, since all available words are worldly. (3) Phenomenology goes to a realm beyond logic, individuation, and determination, which ordinarily structure understanding. In this extreme form, then, the Freiburg reading of Husserl's work is a locked door for the newcomer who is trying to get acquainted with Husserl's phenomenology.

Fortunately, there are other hermeneutical options. A second group of commentators read Husserl "forward" from his intellectual beginnings at Vienna and Halle. The early work in mathematics and logic continues to attract the interest of Analytic philosophers. They are among those who argue that Husserl's concern with numbers and logical reasoning, stimulated by the Kantian challenge, fructified in the prescription of eidetic and, eventually, phenomenological reductions.

Besides reading Husserl from Halle "forward" or from Freiburg "backward," there is yet a third option. One may base one's reading upon the Göttingen period and upon questions involving the genesis of the Ideen, as the keystone in the arch of Husserl's development. This is the stance suggested by Ingarden, who considered Husserl's later transcendentalism a big mistake, and by Stein, whose own subsequent works unfold the implications of the realism and personalism embraced by Husserl at that period. On this view the world, lost by Kant, is won back for science.

The problems of oneness and unity occupied Husserl throughout all the phases of his philosophical development: his earliest work on number and logic, his pre-war realist descriptive phenomenology, and his idealist transcendental phenomenology. His philosophy in some respects parallels the emergence of modern psychology, with whose tenets it should not be confused. The following are his major works.

3. On the Concept of Number (Übert den Begriff der Zahl, 1887)

Husserl's Habilitationsschrift is subtitled "psychological analyses," and it addresses the question how we recognize manyness within a group. Husserl remarks that the common definition of number--that number is a multiplicity of units--leaves two key questions unanswered: "What is 'multiplicity'? And what is 'unity'?" It is the former question, multiplicity, that occupies his attention throughout the essay. However the latter question, unity, haunts the discussion and refuses to be ignored.

Husserl locates the origin of multiplicity in the activity of combining, which he takes to be a psychological process. After much consideration he identifies this activity as synthesis, or the gathering of items into a set. He notices then that synthetic unities are of two kinds. Either the relationship through which the multiple items belong to the one set is a content of the mental representation of those items (right in there alongside them as another item that can be attended to and counted), or it is not there. In the former case, the unity is physical. Otherwise it is psychical, stemming from the unifying mental act that sets the contents into the relationship.

Having made that distinction between natural or physical unity, and arbitrary or imposed unity, Husserl then goes on to contrast these varieties of synthetic oneness with something else entirely: unsynthesized unity. His example is a rose, whose so-called parts are continuous and come apart only for the examining mind.

"In order to note the uniting relations in such a whole, analysis is necessary. If, for example, we are dealing with the representational whole which we call 'a rose,' we get at its various parts successively, by means of analysis: the leaves, the stem.... Each part is thrown into relief by a distinct act of noticing, and is steadily held together with those parts already segregated" (114).

Ironically, Husserl has struck gold while mining coal, and doesn't quite recognize what he's got hold of. His description of nonsynthesized unity comes almost as a byproduct of his attempt to differentiate physical or real collective combination from psychic combination. He writes:

"... these combining relations present themselves as, so to speak, a certain 'more,' in contrast to the mere totality, which appears merely to seize upon its parts, but not really to unite them [because they're already united, independently of the mind!].... In the totality there is a lack of any intuitive unification, as that sort of unification so clearly manifests itself in the metaphysical or continuous whole" (114).

Husserl has succeeded in distinguishing between natural and artificially synthesized wholes, on the one hand, and, on the other hand, those totalities that are known as having been accomplished neither by natural aggregation nor by mental combination. The unity of such wholes is known to be real, even though it admits of subsequent mental analysis or physical dissection.

Again ironically, in his concluding discussion of "number" Husserl neglects to notice the number one even as he employs it to illustrate how combination works. Substituting the term "and" for the term "collective combination," Husserl remarks:

"(T)otality or multiplicity in abstracto is nothing other than 'something or other', and 'something or other', and 'something or other', etc.; or, more briefly, one thing, and one thing, and one thing, etc. Thus we see that the concept of the multiplicity contains, besides the concept of collective combination, only the concept something. Now this most general of all concepts is, as to its origin and content, easily analyzed" (116).

Husserl terms the concept something the most general concept. It stands for any object--real or unreal, physical or psychical--upon which we reflect. Thus he says that multiplicity as a concept arises out of the indetermination of the et-cetera that allows the series of "one and one and one and ..." to go however far you like.

Yet an objection must be registered concerning what Husserl has found but not noticed. Multiplicity is but relatively undetermined; ultimately, multiplicity is in fact determined, or reined in, by one itself. This happens at three points. (a) One is the starting point of the counting series. Every number except the first number is a multiplicity; therefore the set of natural numbers is greater (by one!) than the set of multiplicities. (b) One determines the unit of counting. Only one something at a time gets counted. The and's must be put in between one's. (c) Although the series can stop anywhere, nevertheless it has to stop at one single place, not at several places. Every number is one distinct number.

Husserl, however, tries to produce the concept number by suppressing what he has taken to be the absolute indetermination of the something-series. This is how he gets determinate multiplicity, which he equates with number. In other words, the and's are the main ingredient for making numbers Husserl-style. This is incorrect, of course, but it is incorrect in an interesting way. For example, to make the number five, you would need four and's. To come up with those four and's, you would have to count them out; but before you could count to four, you would need three and's with which to make that four. But... there's a regression back to one. The number five is four and's, and five one's.

The maddening difficulty of focusing upon combination eventually will have a happy outcome, which Husserl did not see in 1887. The truly interesting problem is one, the prime ingredient in numbers and the determiner whose own determination was to become Husserl's guiding quest.

4. Logical Investigations (Logische Untersuchungen, 1900-01)

With the turn of the century, Husserl's attention turned from and to one; that is, away from the mental activity of combining, and toward that which is reliably there to be combined. He wanted to show that mental activity is not the source of the latter. Chapter 8 of LU I exposes and refutes the three premises or "prejudices" of psychologism. In short, "psychologism" for Husserl is the error of collapsing the normative or regulative discipline of logic down onto the merely descriptive discipline of psychology. It would make mental operations (such as combination) the source of their own regulation. The "should" of logic, that utter necessity inhering in logical inference, would become no more than the "is" or facticity of our customary thinking processes, empirically described.

Husserl's formulation and refutation of the three psychologistic premises is wickedly clever, but cannot be treated in detail here. (See # 43-49 of LU I.) One example must suffice. Psychologism, Husserl charges, would place logical inferences on the same plane with mental operations (# 44), and this would make even mathematics into a branch of psychology (# 45). Indeed, math and logic do have structures that are isomorphic to those of mental operations, such as combination and distinction. But given that similarity, how then would one distinguish the regulation of any of these processes from the description of it? Under psychologism, there's no way. But Husserl makes the distinction in a way that also shows how regulation (that is, the laws of logic) comes from elsewhere than the plane of mental activity.

And he does this by virtue of one. In # 46 Husserl agrees with his opponents that arithmetical operations occur in patterns that refer back to mental acts for their origin and also for their meaning. However, there's a difference between them as well. Mental acts transpire in time: they begin and end, and they can be repeated and individually counted. Numbers, in contrast, are timeless. While they can be represented in mental acts, this representation is not a fresh production of the number but rather an instantiation of its form. There is only one five. Any time we count five things, it isn't a production of a new five but merely a deja vu for the same old five, eternal five. We can't count numbers themselves, for there's only one of each. (A similar argument is made in #22 of Ideas I.)

The same goes for logic, Husserl says. Concepts comprising the laws of pure logic can have no empirical range. Their range or sphere is ideal singulars, not mental generalizations from multiple instantiations. The operators of logic are other than those mental acts that happen to share the same names: "and," "not," "is," "or," "implies," "may," "must," "should." Psychologically, there can be many factual acts of combining, negating, etc. Logically, there is only one "and," one "not," etc. Husserl concedes here, as he did for arithmetic, that the logical operators take their origin and meaning from the mental acts. This accounts for the equivocal character of logical terms, which refer both to ideal singulars, and to mental states and acts. But if you fail to notice this equivocation, you become ensnared in psychologism, losing the possibility of pure logic and unified science.

The danger of equivocation extends over judgments as well. On the one hand, we can count multiple apperceptive events of affirmation, occurring psychologically, which proceed in time, begin and end, and recur as often as we like, in happenings that can be distinguished one from another. On the other hand, the judgment thus reached remains the same throughout each act accessing it. It seems to persist and to be called back for encore appearances; it seems even to have pre-existed its first appearance to me (# 47). In this latter sense, the judgment is not the same as the mental act that reaches it. Moreover, the truth of the judgment is neither equivalent to nor dependent upon the psychological experience of clear evidence that accompanies the mental act embracing it. Husserl easily shows this by recalling that in both logic and arithmetic, there are truths that have never been entertained in any human consciousness, and indeed could never be humanly conceived (# 50). (Cases of truth without the possibility of psychological evidence would include the computation of very large numbers, and decisions about membership in sets that are uncountably large. The arithmetical and logical operations connected with such determinations could never be "done" by a human mind or a computer. Their truth cannot be "factual.")

The number one, then, has become Husserl's touchstone for discriminating between psychological processes and logical laws. It is his reality detector. What is psychological (or empirical) comes on in discrete individual instances--ones--and you can examine their edges. What is logical (or ideal) comes on as a seamless oceanic unity without temporal edges, reliably persisting even when not attended to. Husserl's sensitivity to the modes of unity, first expressed in the Habilitationsschrift and developed in LU, provides the launching pad for transcendental phenomenology.

5. Ideas I (Ideen I, 1913)

What launches transcendental phenomenology is the recognition that those modes of unity correlate with each other and with a third mode of unity, in ways that are tantalizingly asymmetrical. These three onenesses are: the factual unity of things and states of affairs, the eidetic unity of essences, and the living unity of consciousness as it flows along in a stream of experiences. Each has, and exhibits, its own distinctive kind of identity and persistence. Factual and essential unities give objects to the straightforward regard of consciousness, entering it as items of experience, each in its distinctive way; but consciousness can also deflect its regard back onto these enterings and discover its own unity, which is unlike either of theirs.

The possibility of this complex correlation is provided by the "principle of principles": that intuitions come on to us with distinctive boundary-conditions that we can accept as sources insuring the correctness of our knowledge of them. Or in Husserl's formulation:

"... that every originary presentive intuition is a legitimizing source of cognition, that everything originarily (so to speak, in its "personal" actuality) offered to us in 'intuition' is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there" (44).

The different kinds of unities have different kinds of edges, and these give away what kind of a unity each of them is going to be. But it's easy to miss the differences. That happens in the natural attitude, Husserl says, when all the objects of consciousness are taken as if they were factual items. Husserl complains that even his Logische Untersuchungen have been misunderstood as advocating just this error of "Platonic realism," by those who read into his use of the term "object" the implication that, through a perverse hypostatization, every thought turns into a thing (# 22). On the contrary, he says, the eidetic reduction, operative already in LU, empowers him to differentiate between how essences appear, and how cases appear.

Now with Ideen I, this distinction is sketched in beautiful detail. You can tell when the object occupying your consciousness is a physical thing, because things don't give themselves to you all at once. What you get instead is a perspective inviting you to move around to the other side to perceive some more of the thing. All the while the thing keeps its unity to itself, as the reference point of all the angles it gives to you, and out of which you must reproduce or copy or simulate the unified thing as you conceive it. But in conceiving, you don't have to put an "and" between two separate perceptions, the north face of a building and the south face, in order to yield the perception of the building as if it were a sum. These different views are given to you as continuous, as views of one thing.

Husserl terms this "shading off" or adumbration. (The notion of off-shading is reminiscent of a multiple-exposure photograph that captures successive phases of a movement in a single frame. Such photos were being seen for the first time at the turn of the century. Husserl also mentions new media such as the stereoscope and the cinema.) In contrast, essences give themselves to you all at once. Their boundaries are not sides, but rather laws entailing the characteristic necessities and possibilities of kinds of things (more about which below). The unity of any particular essence coheres within that determinate outermost boundary which free imaginative variations of possible cases must not exceed if they are to remain cases of this particular kind. Essential unity is centripetal, so to speak.

Then are those other unities--the ones presenting themselves as extended or factual--to be termed centrifugal, inasmuch as each spins off appearances in all directions from an inaccessible center? No, for their off-shading appears contextualized, as a foreground; and even as we focus upon the foreground it pulls its background into readiness for perception as soon as attention may shift to it. Every one is surrounded by a halo of and's, and beyond that are other somethings, seemingly without end. Whatever is extended is inexorably connected to whatever else is extended. (This last formulation, by the way, is an instance of an eidetic law. But the shift of attention that brings this essential rule into view is an eidetic reduction, and it wrenches us away from our naive attention to instances of things naturally appearing, under consideration here.) Every perception "motivates" another, stretching on toward expanding horizons.

The shift to the transcendental attitude--that is, the phenomenological or transcendental reduction--brings to Husserl's notice a third kind of unity, which discloses the off-shading of things in a startling new way. We notice now that what is adumbrated is spatial, but the adumbration itself is not spatial. It arises in consciousness. "Abschattung ist Erlebnis" (95), while what is adumbrated, das Abgeschattete, has to be something spatial. The off-shading of things is at the same time the streaming of conscious life. Peculiarly, the giving off of partial perceptibilities (by the thing) coincides with the taking up of partial perceptions (by streaming consciousness). Which one is doing the shading? Agency cannot be imputed absolutely to either side.

But on the "side" of consciousness, as it were, we now recognize that we are dealing with more than a progression of life-bites strung together in series with and's. The stream of conscious life is not a sum or aggregate; nor is it a generalization. That is, it exhibits a unity unlike either the sachverhaltig unity of a factual case or the eidetisch unity of an essence. Husserl must account for that unity, which he calls an ego, Ich.

Moreover, and of paramount significance, with the benefit of the transcendental reduction it can now be told that these three kinds of unities themselves are not connected merely in series, with and's combining them, as if they were three discrete somethings. Their relationship is vastly more subtle. In order to understand it, through reduction we try to isolate unity from what accounts for unity. (We are not looking for something "prior to" unity -- such as some "cause" of unity --, because we can't have priority without having the number one, and oneness is just what is in question.)

Isolating oneness from the live experience-stream means removing the individual subject (you or me or Napoleon or whomever) from consideration. What is left, says Husserl, is transcendental subjectivity, "the pure act-process with its own essence" ("das reine Akterlebnis mit seinem eigenen Wesen"). (Paradoxically, we can see, right here in this formulation, that the reduction has not at all done away with essence, with states of affairs, or even with identity. We still have Eigenheit and Wesen, set in relation within a sentence. But these are now supposedly purified.) Husserl likens this de-individualized ego to a ray (# 92) or glance (# 101). Characteristically (or essentially) it has two poles or directions: the noematic and the noetic (from Greek terms noema and noesis, indicating what is thought and the act of thinking, respectively).

Husserl's discussion of "noetic-noematic structures" fails in its attempt to show how the ego reaches and secures both the unity of the known object, and the unity of the knowing subject. But it fails in a spectacular starburst of insight. Husserl notices that the mental stream has its own distinctive kind of adumbrations or continuities, which are more complex than those discussed above, the relatively simple off-shaded appearings of spatial objects in perception. Beyond that simple sort of off-shading, consciousness can also turn back on itself and reflect upon its own intending acts, or on any component thereof. The stream meanders among spatial objects, but can also at whim objectify aspects of its own acts of intending, and consider them. This yields a thick layering of possible objects (# 97). For example, here are some noemata that might enter the live experience stream: pencils ... writing ... German verbs ... the frustration of strong verbs ... Ulrike ... memories in general ... the unreliability of memory ... components of perceptions ... the advisability of analyzing perceptions into their components ... the smell of popcorn wafting into the study ... the effort to resist distractions ... and so forth.

Some of these arise directly from things, while others arise as objectifications of what was inherent a moment ago in the very act of knowing, the noesis. How can we tell the difference? Husserl answers that you can tell when the ego-beam has penetrated through to the bottom of the stack of noemata, so to speak, and has gotten ahold of a thing itself, because at that point, all the aspects of the thing are known immanently--really--in the act of perceiving as being contained in the sense of the thing (# 98). For example, you know popcorn itself when you are perceiving the taste of butter and salt. (You do not know popcorn when you read this sentence; instead, you are reflecting on what it is to know popcorn, and popcorn's qualities are not given immanently within your object. But then while tasting popcorn, saltiness was given immanently but not objectified.)

Husserl rightly points out that we are able to slide up and down the pole of the ego-beam at will, moving now toward the thing, now away from it to consider the act of knowing and its modalities. For example, noematically I can consider a certain cat who probably exists, but then I can turn back noetically to assess the degree of certitude that characterizes my consideration of that selfsame cat as existing (# 105). Now if we were to slide down to the point where all modalities are behind us on the noetic side of the pole, and if there we were to face the object, we would get the pure sense of the object in which its unity is given.

In # 102 Husserl claims that this can happen, and that we can indeed slide far enough toward the object that the unity of the noema will be known as not having been imposed by the act of knowing. At that point, all of its qualities supposedly will be given immanently, really, contained in the perception rather than in the secondary conscious act that may grasp it a split-second later. Its sense will have been captured as something known with certainty to comprise its qualities, without the interference of a synthetic conscious act. (If this worked, it would effectively ensure the objectivity of knowledge, and would win the day for realism against idealism.) Husserl writes:

"The noematic objects ... are unities transcendent to, but evidentially intended to in, the mental process. But if that is the case, then characteristics, which arise in [those unities] for consciousness and which are seized upon as their properties in focusing the regard on them, cannot possibly be regarded as really inherent moments of the mental process" (248-249).

Rather, they inhere in the object's sense, and subsequently are lifted out for analysis in the mental process.

The ambitiousness of this claim is matched by that of another, which has to do with the opposite end of the ego-pole. In # 108 Husserl says that we can also shinny far enough up the ego-pole that we can capture the affirming noesis in its purity. All the modalities will have been loaded over onto the side of the noema, and the no_sis will be a believing affirmation, pure and simple: an unqualified yes. Thus Husserl insists that there is a crucial difference between (a) being validly negated and (b) not-being. For example, he would distinguish (a) denying correctly that my spayed cat has a kitten, from (b) affirming that the kitten of my spayed cat is a non-entity. With (a), the negativity inheres in the noesis, which has not yet been purified of all modality; but with (b), the noesis would be pure affirmation (# 104).

How correct is Husserl's argument? We must grant that whatever makes this particular kitten impossible inheres elsewhere than in my knowing about it, for my denying something can't make it go away. Furthermore, there's nothing to prevent my forcing myself to think positively the thought of the kitten that my cat never had. Such a noetic posture is at least conceivable. However, its mere possibility is not enough to accomplish Husserl's purpose. Husserl needs to show that this pure affirming belief really is done, somewhere somehow, in the toughest case, the case of an intrinsically impossible entity such as the kitten of a spayed cat. (That is, has anyone succeeded in recapturing that magic moment of purely affirming noesis with regard to an intrinsically impossible object? And if so, how would one go about certifying the accomplishment?)

Unfortunately, neither end of the ego-ray connects as Husserl had hoped. At the noetic pole, the purely affirming ego eludes the grasp of consciousness; so does the pure sense of the thing itself, at the noematic pole. These terms may remain as ideal asymptotes toward which the ego-ray continually points while continually falling short. The successful recovery of the connection between knowing and reality awaits another strategy, to be mounted by Husserl in the posthumously published second volume of Ideen.

6. Ideas II (Ideen II)

The second volume of Husserl's Ideen (publication withheld until 1952) is the work of many hands. Husserl was dissatisfied with it and did not publish it. The first draft was written very rapidly in 1912, immediately after the manuscript of the first volume was completed. Husserl added material in 1915, and turned it over for editing to his assistant Edith Stein, who had come with him to Freiburg from Gottingen. Stein transcribed the work from Husserl's shorthand in 1916. He gave her further material, and in 1918 she produced a collation arranged and titled as at present: the constitution of material nature, of animal nature, and of the cultural world. But Husserl's phenomenology was evolving, and the manuscript did not suit him. Another assistant, Ludwig Landgrebe, worked on it 1923-25, and Husserl himself edited it in again 1928. It finally came out posthumously.

If the pursuit of unity had guided Husserl like a north star from his earliest writing on through the discovery and first articulation of phenomenology, then in Ideen II that star becomes obscured by "light pollution" from numerous more recent and competing insights. Without access to the manuscripts, it is impossible to know with precision how that came about. In portions of the text as we have it, the concern with unity remains a significant factor.

However, other portions seem to go against the grain of key insights from the first volume and the earlier works. For example, in LU and Ideen I, the material sphere had comprised states of affairs; that is, facts or cases such as could be expressed in logical propositions. There were indeed "things" in there, such as roses, yet the emphasis was upon the factual scenarios into which these things figured. By contrast, in Ideen II "material nature" is populated with substantial items, and the fact they are embedded in circumstances has to be additionally stipulated, almost as an afterthought (# 15c). By the same token, in the earlier work the eidetic sphere had comprised the forms of logical propositions and the rules of inference. While there were indeed "essences" entailed there, nevertheless the emphasis fell upon the lawful patterns of thinking about being. By contrast, in Ideen II "animal nature" is populated by psychic items whose unity is analogous to that of physical things yet whose active engagement with the latter can hardly be explained.

This shift matters, because judgments and perceptions reach unity in quite different ways. To certify that one selfsame proposition (e.g., that the cat is on the mat) returns to our consciousness on several occasions is quite a different task than to certify that one selfsame substantial entity (e.g., this mat-loving cat) returns to our sight every afternoon. Husserl's early discoveries about unity had to do with judgment, and they were based upon the lived difference between synthetic judgments and analytic judgments. His ambitions then were not primarily metaphysical or epistemological. Moreover, it is relatively easy to "feel" the difference among three sorts of judgment: (a) a synthetic judgment that arbitrarily groups several items together, (b) a synthetic judgment that groups things in recognition of some characteristic that all share independently of the judgment, and (c) a judgment that the unity imputed to a thing is not owing to judgment at all. The distinction among these judgment-forms was already established in the Habilitationsschrift. However the task undertaken in Ideen II is forcibly to transpose that distinction onto perception, and so to come up with a general test for certifying when knowledge is genuinely in touch with reality.

This project is set in motion in # 9, where new terminology is introduced for the threefold distinction first made in "Begriff der Zahl." (However, now that the transcendental reduction is presupposed, the arrow of causality should be removed. There can be only correlation or its absence.) BZ's "psychic relation" now becomes "categorial synthesis," in which perception serendipitously collects disparate items into one group, for no special reason intrinsic to the items. BZ's "content relation" (or "physical relation") becomes "aesthetic synthesis" (or "sensuous synthesis"), in which perception recognizes some intrinsic reason for grouping these items and finds itself constrained to do so by something other than mere whim. And BZ's uncomposed unity (e.g., "that rose there") becomes the "pure sense-object."

In BZ, "synthesis" meant a combining judgment: a judgment that erected a set of things with many members. A set with one member--that is, a unified thing--obviously needed no synthesizing judgment to set it up. In Ideen II, however, "synthesis" means a perception that, while receiving multiple impressions (the off-shadings or Abschattungen), composes an object out of them. But this object is a unity, not a group; in fact, it is what Husserl would earlier have called an uncomposed unity. In other words aesthetic synthesis--operating now over partial views, not discrete items--finds that it has a reason for referring those multiple impressions to one object, even though the unity of the thing never gives itself directly to consciousness. What is that reason? This question is enticing, because Husserl is tantalizingly close here to describing a way in which the real unity of things is available for knowledge.

Husserl works on this question in # 15b, where "the spatial body is a synthetic unity of a manifold of strata of 'sensuous appearances' of different senses" (42-43). The spatially extended thing is a unity drawing together all the experiences we have had of it, and summoning us toward further experiences of it through sight and touch and our other senses. It achieves its unity as a spatial location, which seems not to depend upon whether or not it is actually perceived.

However, Husserl cautions, this unity alone is insufficient to validate itself. He writes:

"(W)e have first taken the body as independent of all causal conditioning, i.e., merely as a unity which presents itself visually or tactually, through multiplicities of sensations, as endowed with an inner content of characteristic features.... But in what we have said, it is also implied that under the presupposition referred to (namely, that we take the thing outside of the nexuses in which it is a thing) we do not find, as we carry out experiences, any possibility for deciding, in a way that exhibits, whether the experienced material thing is actual or whether we are subject to mere illusion and are experiencing a mere phantom" (43).

Thus, reality is not guaranteed for an isolated item, even when it seems to be giving us a reason to take it as the unified core attracting its manifold appearings to one hub of reference. The central location of the thing is dependent upon its real circumstances, as Husserl goes on to say in # 15c. The reality of "one" depends on "others"; i.e., on thing-connection. The thing is what it is in relation to its surroundings. This becomes apparent when things move and change, for their changes must correlate coherently with reciprocal changes in the things next to them.

Such co-variance is what certifies reality--or materiality, which Husserl seems to equate with it. In # 15c, reality means substantial causality. Within the webwork of material things, everything affects everything else. The real is the causal. Co-variance across the material realm, then, is what certifies the oneness and reality of that realm (# 15e).

Animated bodies also connect in the webwork of material things (# 13). Each of them is a center of appearings, a one, just as every other thing is. However, unlike soulless bodies, each animal is also a zero. It lives at a point of origination. The animal body bears the zero-point of orientation for the pure ego (61), as its absolute "here" (135, 166). Arithmetically, this is a stunning contrast. Every "something" whatsoever is either a one or a one-and-one-and-etc. But the animated body, in addition to being just one of those somethings, is also the one who is zero: the one from whom the counting starts, the one who chooses whether and where it is appropriate to insert the and's.

But any series that is initiated by/at/in the living body is counted off nonarbitrarily. Such series go in order; they are "motivated." This is owing to the movement of the body itself within the material web. The body's own kinesthetic sense will coordinate with the corresponding changes in sensory perceptions as it navigates among things. Thus, the zero shifts position in relation to the other unified centers to which perceptions accrue; but as it does so, the series of their appearings change in a regular way (63).

What about counting zero's? Are they multiple; are there many human bodies? Husserl declines to pursue this avenue of approach into the problem of other minds and human community. Intersubjectivity will treated instead as an implication of the reality of the material world, not a precondition for it. The multiplicity of bodies is taken up only on page 83, where it is admitted that the foregoing analysis has been framed on the assumption that there would be only one, "solipsistic," point-zero in reality. Belatedly, other bodies now are brought into the picture--but not because they are necessary for its unity, or because they have been apprehended among the realities presenting to consciousness. The others are brought in because they are required for the full unification of the thing in reality, whether that thing is one of the physical bodies or my very own live body. To be is to be describable (87). Reality for the thing entails a possibility of appearing to anyone at all. Being counted from one zero-point is not enough for the real thing. To count, it needs the possibility of being counted from multiple directions.

The thing is a rule of appearances. That means that the thing is a reality as a unity of a manifold of appearances connected according to rules. Moreover, this unity is an intersubjective one.... The physicalistic thing is intersubjectively common in that it has validity for all individuals who stand in possible communion with us (91-92).

To be real, the thing must count as a place or location, a center, independently of any particular point of origin. Yet what grants reality to the thing is not some consensus reached by observers. Indeed, the thing may look entirely different to different observers; however, its reality constrains all to agree that, at least, "it is there." Oddly, then, the real thing is another kind of zero, for its barest reality consists in its being an empty place-holder (91-93).

Finally, Husserl makes unity a synonym for the philosophical term "substance" as traditionally meant. For example, he says that both the soul and the body are unities, so that an analogy obtains between psychic unity and material unity (129, 131). Oneness becomes the ontological form that determines substantial reality (133). The pure ego is one with respect to an individual stream of consciousness, that is, before the transcendental reduction has de-individuated the latter (117); however the pure ego is insubstantial and not one whenever the reduction is in effect (128).

And so Husserl's quest for unity splinters and spends itself out by diverting into many contradictory projects pursued by the many unharmonized voices of Ideen II. Although the manuscript remained unpublished, it was made available for consultation by a number of Husserl's younger colleagues. Among the last publication of Husserl's lifetime was the Cartesian Meditations of 1931, in which he addressed the apparent solipsism of his transcendental phenomenology. That work itself was undergoing a comprehensive reworking in partnership with Husserl's assistant Eugen Fink during the years before Husserl's death in 1938.

7. References and Further Reading

Husserl's publications and his extensive Nachlass are being brought out in a multi-volume critical edition entitled Husserliana - Edmund Husserl, Gesammelte Werke, from Nijhoff in The Hague. The major works published during Husserl's lifetime are the following:

  • Über den Begriff der Zahl. Psychologische Analysen, 1887.
  • Philosophie der Arithmetik. Psychologische und logische Untersuchungen, 1891.
  • Logische Untersuchungen. Erste Teil: Prolegomena zur reinen Logik, 1900; reprinted 1913.
  • Logische Untersuchungen. Zweite Teil: Untersuchungen zur Phänomenologie und Theorie der Erkenntnis, 1901; second edition 1913 (for part one); second edition 1921 (for part two).
  • "Philosophie als strenge Wissenschaft," Logos 1 (1911) 289-341.
  • Ideen zu einer reinen Ph‰nomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie. Erstes Buch: Allgemeine Einführung in die reine Phänomenologie, 1913.
  • "Vorlesungen zur Phänomenologie des inneren Zeitbewusstseins," Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung 9 (1928), 367-498.
  • "Formale und transzendentale Logik. Versuch einer Kritik der logischen Vernunft," Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung 10 (1929) 1-298.
  • Mèditations cartèsiennes, 1931.
  • "Die Krisis der europäischen Wissenschaften und die transzentale Phänomenologie: Eine Einleitung in die phänomenologische Philosophie," Philosophia 1 (1936) 77-176.

Works translated into English by Husserl (In chronological order.  Publication dates of the German originals are in brackets.)

  • "Philosophy as Rigorous Science," trans. in Q. Lauer (ed.), Phenomenology and the Crisis of Philosophy, New York: Harper [1910], 1965.
  • Formal and Transcendental Logic, trans. D. Cairns. The Hague: Nijhoff [1929], 1969.
  • The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Philosophy, trans. D. Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press
    [1936/54], 1970.
  • Logical Investigations, trans. J. N. Findlay, London: Routledge [1900/01; 2nd, revised edition 1913], 1973.
  • Experience and Judgement, trans. J. S. Churchill and K. Ameriks, London: Routledge [1939], 1973.
  • Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy - Third Book: Phenomenology and the Foundations of the Sciences, trans. T. E. Klein and W. E. Pohl, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1980.
  • Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy -- First Book: General Introduction to a Pure Phenomenology, trans. F. Kersten. The Hague: Nijhoff (= Ideas) [1913], 1982.
  • Cartesian Meditations, trans. D. Cairns, Dordrecht: Kluwer [1931], 1988.
  • Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy - Second Book: Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution, trans. R. Rojcewicz and A. Schuwer, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989.
  • On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917), trans. J. B. Brough, Dordrecht: Kluwer [1928], 1990.
  • Early Writings in the Philosophy of Logic and Mathematics, trans. D. Willard, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1994.
  • The Essential Husserl, ed. D. Welton, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999.

Further Reading:

  • Bell, David (1990) Husserl, London: Routledge.
  • Bernet, Rudolf and Kern, Iso and Marbach, Eduard (1993) An Introduction to Husserlian Phenomenology, Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Carr, David (1987) Interpreting Husserl, Dordrecht: Nijhoff.
  • Derrida, Jacques (1978) Edmund Husserl's 'Origin of Geometry', trans. J.P. Leavy, New York: Harvester Press, 1978.
  • Dreyfus, Hubert (ed.) (1982) Husserl, Intentionality, and Cognitive Science, Cambridge/Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Drummond, John (1990) Husserlian Intentionality and Non-Foundational Realism, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Levinas, E., (1973) The Theory of Intuition in Husserl's Phenomenology, Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Mohanty, J. N. and McKenna, William (eds.) (1989) Husserl's Phenomenology: A Textbook, Lanham: University Press of America.
  • Smith, Barry and Smith, David Woodruff (eds.) (1995) The Cambridge Companion to Husserl, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sokolowski, Robert (ed.) (1988) Edmund Husserl and the Phenomenological Tradition, Washington: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Zahavi, Dan (2003) Husserl's Phenomenology, Stanford: Stanford University Press.


Author Information

Marianne Sawicki
Dickinson School of Law, Pennsylvania State University
U. S. A.

Contemporary Metaphilosophy

What is philosophy? What is philosophy for? How should philosophy be done? These are metaphilosophical questions, metaphilosophy being the study of the nature of philosophy. Contemporary metaphilosophies within the Western philosophical tradition can be divided, rather roughly, according to whether they are associated with (1) Analytic philosophy, (2) Pragmatist philosophy, or (3) Continental philosophy.

The pioneers of the Analytic movement held that philosophy should begin with the analysis of propositions. In the hands of two of those pioneers, Russell and Wittgenstein, such analysis gives a central role to logic and aims at disclosing the deep structure of the world. But Russell and Wittgenstein thought philosophy could say little about ethics. The movement known as Logical Positivism shared the aversion to normative ethics. Nonetheless, the positivists meant to be progressive. As part of that, they intended to eliminate metaphysics. The so-called ordinary language philosophers agreed that philosophy centrally involved the analysis of propositions, but, and this recalls a third Analytic pioneer, namely Moore, their analyses remained at the level of natural language as against logic. The later Wittgenstein has an affinity with ordinary language philosophy. For Wittgenstein had come to hold that philosophy should protect us against dangerous illusions by being a kind of therapy for what normally passes for philosophy. Metaphilosophical views held by later Analytic philosophers include the idea that philosophy can be pursued as a descriptive but not a revisionary metaphysics and that philosophy is continuous with science.

The pragmatists, like those Analytic philosophers who work in practical or applied ethics, believed that philosophy should treat ‘real problems’ (although the pragmatists gave ‘real problems’ a wider scope than the ethicists tend to). The neopragmatist Rorty goes so far as to say the philosopher should fashion her philosophy so as to promote her cultural, social, and political goals. So-called post-Analytic philosophy is much influenced by pragmatism. Like the pragmatists, the post-Analyticals tend (1) to favor a broad construal of the philosophical enterprise and (2) to aim at dissolving rather than solving traditional or narrow philosophical problems.

The first Continental position considered herein is Husserl’s phenomenology. Husserl believed that his phenomenological method would enable philosophy to become a rigorous and foundational science. Still, on Husserl’s conception, philosophy is both a personal affair and something that is vital to realizing the humanitarian hopes of the Enlightenment. Husserl’s existential successors modified his method in various ways and stressed, and refashioned, the ideal of authenticity presented by his writings. Another major Continental tradition, namely Critical Theory, makes of philosophy a contributor to emancipatory social theory; and the version of Critical Theory pursued by Jürgen Habermas includes a call for 'postmetaphysical thinking'. The later thought of Heidegger advocates a postmetaphysical thinking too, albeit a very different one; and Heidegger associates metaphysics with the ills of modernity. Heidegger strongly influenced Derrida’s metaphilosophy. Derrida’s deconstructive approach to philosophy (1) aims at clarifying, and loosening the grip of, the assumptions of previous, metaphysical philosophy, and (2) means to have an ethical and political import.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Some Pre-Twentieth Century Metaphilosophy
    2. Defining Metaphilosophy
    3. Explicit and Implicit Metaphilosophy
    4. The Classification of Metaphilosophies – and the Treatment that Follows
  2. Analytic Metaphilosophy
    1. The Analytic Pioneers: Russell, the Early Wittgenstein, and Moore
    2. Logical Positivism
    3. Ordinary Language Philosophy and the Later Wittgenstein
    4. Three Revivals
      1. Normative Philosophy including Rawls and Practical Ethics
      2. History of Philosophy
      3. Metaphysics: Strawson, Quine, Kripke
    5. Naturalism including Experimentalism and Its Challenge to Intuitions
  3. Pragmatism, Neopragmatism, and Post-Analytic Philosophy
    1. Pragmatism
    2. Neopragmatism: Rorty
    3. Post-Analytic Philosophy
  4. Continental Metaphilosophy
    1. Phenomenology and Related Currents
      1. Husserl’s Phenomenology
      2. Existential Phenomenology, Hermeneutics, Existentialism
    2. Critical Theory
      1. Critical Theory and the Critique of Instrumental Reason
      2. Habermas
    3. The Later Heidegger
    4. Derrida's Post-Structuralism
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Explicit Metaphilosophy and Works about Philosophical Movements or Traditions
    2. Analytic Philosophy including Wittgenstein, Post-Analytic Philosophy, and Logical Pragmatism
    3. Pragmatism and Neopragmatism
    4. Continental Philosophy
    5. Other

1. Introduction

The main topic of the article is the Western metaphilosophy of the last hundred years or so. But that topic is broached via a sketch of some earlier Western metaphilosophies. (In the case of the sketch, ‘Western’ means European. In the remainder of the article, ‘Western’ means European and North American. On Eastern meta­philosophy, see the entries filed under such heads as ‘Chinese philosophy’ and ‘Indian philosophy’.) Once that sketch is in hand, the article defines the notion of metaphilosophy and distinguishes between explicit and implicit metaphilosophy. Then there is a consideration of how metaphilosophies might be categorized and an outline of the course of the remainder of the article.

a. Some Pre-Twentieth Century Metaphilosophy

Socrates believed that the unexamined life – the unphilosophical life – was not worth living (Plato, Apology, 38a). Indeed, Socrates saw his role as helping to rouse people from unreflective lives. He did this by showing them, through his famous ‘Socratic method’, that in fact they knew little about, for example, justice, beauty, love or piety. Socrates’ use of that method contributed to his being condemned to death by the Athenian state. But Socrates’ politics contributed too; and here one can note that, according to the Republic (473c-d), humanity will prosper only when philosophers are kings or kings’ philosophers. It is notable too that, in Plato’s Phaedo, Socrates presents death as liberation of the soul from the tomb of the body.

According to Aristotle, philosophy begins in wonder, seeks the most fundamental causes or principles of things, and is the least necessary but thereby the most divine of sciences (Metaphysics, book alpha, sections 1–3). Despite the point about necessity, Aristotle taught ethics, a subject he conceived as ‘a kind of political science’ (Nicomachean Ethics, book 1) and which had the aim of making men good. Later philosophers continued and even intensified the stress on philosophical practicality. According to the Hellenistic philosophers – the Cynics, Sceptics, Epicureans and Stoics - philosophy revealed (1) what was valuable and what was not, and (2) how one could achieve the former and protect oneself against longing for the latter. The Roman Cicero held that to study philosophy is to prepare oneself for death. The later and neoplatonic thinker Plotinus asked, ‘What, then, is Philosophy?’ and answered, ‘Philosophy is the supremely precious’ (Enneads, I.3.v): a means to blissful contact with a mystical principle he called ‘the One’.

The idea that philosophy is the handmaiden of theology, earlier propounded by the Hellenistic thinker Philo of Alexandria, is most associated with the medieval age and particularly with Aquinas. Aquinas resumed the project of synthesizing Christianity with Greek philosophy - a project that had been pursued already by various thinkers including Augustine, Anselm, and Boethius. (Boethius was a politician inspired by philosophy – but the politics ended badly for him. In those respects he resembles the earlier Seneca. And, like Seneca, Boethius wrote of the consolations of philosophy.)

‘[T]he word “philosophy” means the study [or love – philo] of wisdom, and by “wisdom” is meant not only prudence in our everyday affairs but also a perfect knowledge of all things that mankind is capable of knowing, both for the conduct of life and for the preservation of health and the discovery of all manner of skills.’ Thus Descartes (1988: p. 179). Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding (bk. 4. ch. 19, p. 697) connects philosophy with the love of truth and identifies the following as an ‘unerring mark’ of that love: ‘The not entertaining any Proposition with greater assurance than the Proofs it is built upon will warrant.’ Hume’s ‘Of Suicide’ opens thus: ‘One considerable advantage that arises from Philosophy, consists in the sovereign antidote which it affords to superstition and false religion’ (Hume 1980: 97). Kant held that ‘What can I know?’, ‘What ought I to do?’, and, ‘What may I hope?’ were the ultimate questions of human reason (Critique of Pure Reason, A805 / B33) and asserted that philosophy’s ‘peculiar dignity’ lies in ‘principles of morality, legislation, and religion’ that it can provide (A318 / B375). According to Hegel, the point of philosophy – or of ‘the dialectic’ – is to enable people to recognize the embodiment of their ideals in their social and political lives and thereby to be at home in the world. Marx’s famous eleventh ‘Thesis on Feuerbach’ declared that, while philosophers had interpreted the world, the point was to change it.

b. Defining Metaphilosophy

As the foregoing sketch begins to suggest, three very general metaphilosophical questions are (1) What is philosophy? (2) What is, or what should be, the point of philosophy? (3) How should one do philosophy? Those questions resolve into a host of more specific meta­philosophical conundra, some of which are as follows. Is philosophy a process or a product? What kind of knowledge can philosophy attain? How should one understand philosophical disagreement? Is philosophy historical in some special or deep way? Should philosophy make us better people? Happier people? Is philosophy political? What method(s) and types of evidence suit philosophy? How should philosophy be written (presuming it should be written at all)? Is philosophy, in some sense, over – or should it be?

But how might one define metaphilosophy? One definition owes to Morris Lazerowitz. (Lazerowitz claims to have invented the English word ‘metaphilosophy’ in 1940. But some foreign-language equivalents of the term ‘metaphilosophy’ antedate 1940. Note further that, in various languages including English, sometimes the term takes a hyphen before the ‘meta’.) Lazerowitz proposed (1970) that metaphilosophy is ‘the investigation of the nature of philosophy.’ If we take ‘nature’ to include both the point of philosophy and how one does (or should do) philosophy, then that definition fits with the most general meta­philosophical questions just identified above. Still: there are other definitions of metaphilosophy; and while Lazerowitz’s definition will prove best for our purposes, one needs – in order to appreciate that fact, and in order to give the definition a suitable (further) gloss – to survey the alternatives.

One alternative definition construes metaphilosophy as the philosophy of philosophy. Sometimes that definition intends this idea: metaphilosophy applies the method(s) of philosophy to philosophy itself. That idea itself comes in two versions. One is a ‘first-order’ construal. The thought here is this. Metaphilosophy, as the application of philosophy to philosophy itself, is simply one more instance of philosophy (Wittgenstein 2001: section 121; Williamson 2007: ix). The other version – the ‘second-order’ version of the idea that metaphilosophy applies philosophy to itself – is as follows. Metaphilosophy stands to philosophy as philosophy stands to its subject matter or to other disciplines (Rescher 2006), such that, as Williamson puts it (loc. cit) metaphilosophy ‘look[s] down upon philosophy from above, or beyond.’ (Williamson himself, who takes the first-order view, prefers the term ‘the philosophy of philosophy’ to ‘metaphilosophy’. For he thinks that ‘metaphilosophy’ has this connotation of looking down.) A different definition of metaphilosophy exploits the fact that ‘meta’ can mean not only about but also after. On this definition, metaphilosophy is post-philosophy. Sometimes Lazerowitz himself used ‘metaphilosophy’ in that way. What he had in mind here, more particularly, is the ‘special kind of investigation which Wittgenstein had described as one of the “heirs” of philosophy’ (Lazerowitz 1970). Some French philosophers have used the term similarly, though with reference to Heidegger and/or Marx rather than to Wittgenstein (Elden 2004: 83).

What then commends Lazerowitz’s (original) definition – the definition whereby metaphilosophy is investigation of the nature (and point) of philosophy? Two things. (1) The two ‘philosophy–of–philosophy’ construals are competing specifications of that definition. Indeed, those construals have little content until after one has a considerable idea of what philosophy is. (2) The equation of metaphilosophy and post-philosophy is narrow and tendentious; but Lazerowitz’s definition accommodates post-philosophy as a position within a more widely construed metaphilosophy. Still: Lazerowitz’s definition does require qualification, since there is a sense in which it is too broad. For ‘investigation of the nature of philosophy’ suggests that any inquiry into philosophy will count as meta­philosophical, whereas an inquiry tends to be deemed meta­philosophical only when it pertains to the essence, or very nature, of philosophy. (Such indeed is a third possible reading of the philosophy-of-philosophy construal.) Now, just what does so pertain is moot; and there is a risk of being too unaccommodating. We might want to deny the title ‘metaphilosophy’ to, say, various sociological studies of philosophy, and even, perhaps, to philosophical pedagogy (that is, to the subject of how philosophy is taught). On the other hand, we are inclined to count as meta­philosophical claims about, for instance, philosophy corrupting its students or about professionalization corrupting philosophy (on these claims one may see Stewart 1995 and Anscombe 1957).

What follows will give a moderately narrow interpretation to the term ‘nature’ within the phrase ‘the nature of philosophy’.

c. Explicit and Implicit Metaphilosophy

Explicit metaphilosophy is metaphilosophy pursued as a subfield of, or attendant field to, philosophy. Metaphilosophy so conceived has waxed and waned. In the early twenty-first century, it has waxed in Europe and in the Anglophone (English-speaking) world. Probable causes of the  increasing interest include Analytic philosophy having become more aware of itself as a tradition, the rise of philosophizing of a more empirical sort, and a softening of the divide between ‘Analytic’ and ‘Continental’ philosophy. (This article will revisit all of those topics in one way or another.) However, even when waxing, metaphilosophy generates much less activity than philosophy. Certainly the philosophical scene contains few book-length pieces of metaphilosophy. Books such as Williamson’s The Philosophy of Philosophy, Rescher’s Essay on Metaphilosophy, and What is Philosophy? by Deleuze and Guattari – these are not the rule but the exception.

There is more to metaphilosophy than explicit metaphilosophy. For there is also implicit metaphilosophy. To appreciate that point, consider, first, that philosophical positions can have meta­philosophical aspects. Many philosophical views – views about, say, knowledge, or language, or authenticity – can have implications for the task or nature of philosophy. Indeed, all philosophizing is somewhat meta­philosophical, at least in this sense: any philosophical view or orientation commits its holder to a metaphilosophy that accommodates it. Thus if one advances an ontology one must have a metaphilosophy that countenances ontology. Similarly, to adopt a method or style is to deem that approach at least passable. Moreover, a conception of the nature and point of philosophy, albeit perhaps an inchoate one, motivates and shapes much philosophy. But – and this is what allows there to be implicit metaphilosophy – sometimes none of this is emphasized, or even appreciated at all, by those who philosophize. Much of the metaphilosophy treated here is implicit, at least in the attenuated sense that its authors give philosophy much more attention than philosophy.

d. The Classification of Metaphilosophies – and the Treatment that Follows

One way of classifying metaphilosophy would be by the aim that a given metaphilosophy attributes to philosophy. Alternatively, one could consider that which is taken as the model for philosophy or for philosophical form. Science? Art? Therapy? Something else? A further alternative is to distinguish metaphilosophies according to whether or not they conceive philosophy as somehow essentially linguistic. Another criterion would be the rejection or adoption or conception of metaphysics (metaphysics being something like the study of' the fundamental nature of reality). And many further classifications are possible.

This article will employ the Analytic–Continental distinction as its most general classificatory schema. Or rather it uses these categories: (1) Analytic philosophy; (2) Continental philosophy; (3) pragmatism, neopragmatism, and post-Analytic philosophy, these being only some of the most important of metaphilosophies of the last century or so. Those metaphilosophies are distinguished from one from another via the philosophies or philosophical movements (movements narrower than those of the three top-level headings) to which they have been conjoined. That approach, and indeed the article's most general schema, means that this account is organized by chronology as much as by theme. One virtue of the approach is that it provides a degree of historical perspective. Another is that the approach helps to disclose some rather implicit metaphilosophy associated with well-known philosophies. But the article will be thematic to a degree because it will bring out some points of identity and difference between various metaphilosophies and will consider criticisms of the metaphilosophies treated. However, the article will not much attempt to determine, on meta­philosophical or other criteria, the respective natures of Analytic philosophy, pragmatism, or Continental philosophy. The article employs those categories solely for organizational purposes. But note the following points.

  1. The particular placing of some individual philosophers within the schema is problematic. The case of the so-called later Wittgenstein is particularly moot. Is he ‘Analytic’? Should he have his own category?
  2. The delineation of the traditions themselves is controversial. The notions of the Analytic and the Continental are particularly vexed. The difficulties here start with the fact that here a geographical category is juxtaposed to a more thematic or doctrinal one (Williams 2003). Moreover, some philosophers deny that Analytic philosophy has any substantial existence (Preston 2007; see also Rorty 1991a: 217); and some assert the same of Continental philosophy (Glendinning 2006: 13 and ff).
  3. Even only within contemporary Western history, there are significant approaches to philosophy that seem to at least somewhat warrant their own categories. Among those approaches are ‘traditionalist philosophy’, which devotes itself to the study of ‘the grand [...] tradition of Western philosophy ranging from the Pre-Socratics to Kant’ (Glock 2008: 85f.), feminism, and environmental philosophy. This article does not examine those approaches.

2. Analytic Metaphilosophy

a. The Analytic Pioneers: Russell, the Early Wittgenstein, and Moore

Bertrand Russell, his pupil Ludwig Wittgenstein, and their colleague G. E. Moore – the pioneers of Analytic philosophy – shared the view that ‘all sound philosophy should begin with an analysis of propositions’ (Russell 1992: 9; first published in 1900). In Russell and Wittgenstein such analysis was centrally a matter of logic. (Note, however, that the expression ‘Analytic philosophy’ seems to have emerged only in the 1930s.)

Russellian analysis has two stages (Beaney 2007: 2–3 and 2009: section 3; Urmson 1956). First, propositions of ordinary or scientific language are transformed into what Russell regarded as their true form. This ‘logical’ or ‘transformative’ analysis draws heavily upon the new logic of Frege and finds its exemplar in Russell’s ‘theory of descriptions’ (Analytic Philosophy, section 2.a). The next step is to correlate elements within the transformed propositions with elements in the world. Commentators have called this second stage or form of analysis – which Russell counted as a matter of ‘philosophical logic’ – ‘reductive’, ‘decompositional’, and ‘metaphysical’. It is decompositional and reductive inasmuch as, like chemical analysis, it seeks to revolve its objects into their simplest elements, such an element being simple in that it itself lacks parts or constituents. The analysis is metaphysical in that it yields a metaphysics. According to the metaphysics that Russell actually derived from his analysis – the metaphysics which he called ‘logical atomism’ – the world comprises indivisible ‘atoms’ that combine, in structures limned by logic, to form the entities of science and everyday life. Russell’s empiricism inclined him to conceive the atoms as mind-independent sense-data. (See further Russell’s Metaphysics, section 4.)

Logic in the dual form of analysis just sketched was the essence of philosophy, according to Russell (2009: ch. 2). Nonetheless, Russell wrote on practical matters, advocating, and campaigning for, liberal and socialist ideas. But he tended to regard such activities as unphilosophical, believing that ethical statements were non-cognitive and hence little amenable to philosophical analysis (see Non-Cognitivism in Ethics). But he did come to hold a form of utilitarianism that allowed ethical statements a kind of truth-aptness. And he did endorse a qualified version of this venerable idea: the contemplation of profound things enlarges the self and fosters happiness. Russell held further that practicing an ethics was little use given contemporary politics, a view informed by worries about the effects of conformity and technocracy. (On all this, see Schultz 1992.)

Wittgenstein agreed with Frege and Russell that ‘the apparent logical form of a proposition need not be its real one’ (Wittgenstein 1961: section 4.0031). And he agreed with Russell that language and the world share a common, ultimately atomistic, form. But Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus developed these ideas into a somewhat Kantian and actually rather Schopenhauerian position. (That book, first published in 1921, is the main and arguably only work of the so-called ‘early Wittgenstein’. section 2.c treats Wittgenstein’s later views.) The Tractatus taught the following. Only when propositions depict possible states of affairs do they have sense. Propositions of science and of everyday language pass that test. Propositions of logic do not quite do so. They have the form necessary for depiction; but they depict nothing because they boil down to either tautologies or contradictions. Hence they are ‘senseless’ (in Wittgenstein’s original German: sinnlos). As to metaphysical statements – statements about, inter alia, the meaning of life and God, and statements of ethics and aesthetics – they are ‘nonsense’ (Unsinn). They try to depict something. But what they try to depict is no possible state of affairs within the world. Wittgenstein concludes that philosophy is ‘a critique of language’ that detects and expunges metaphysical talk (Wittgenstein 1961: section 4.0031). ‘[W]henever someone [...] want[s] to say something metaphysical’, one should ‘demonstrate to him that he had failed to give a meaning to certain signs in his propositions’ (section 6.53). But there is a complication. Wittgenstein (section 6.54–7): ‘anyone who understands me eventually recognizes [my own propositions] as nonsensical, when he has used them–as steps–to climb up beyond them [...] He must transcend these propositions, and then he will see the world aright. What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence’. Still, Wittgenstein applies the honorifics ‘mystical’ and ‘higher’ (section 6.42–6.522) to his statements about the limits of language and to various other metaphysical statements, including ethical ones. In the case of these (‘mystical’/‘higher’) nonsensical propositions, the point of remaining silent about them is not to damn them but rather to leave their truth unprofaned.

Like Russell and Wittgenstein, Moore advocated a form of decompositional analysis. He held that ‘a thing becomes intelligible first when it is analyzed into its constituent concepts’ (Moore 1899: 182; see further Beaney 2009: section 4). But Moore uses normal language rather than logic to specify those constituents; and, in his hands, analysis often supported commonplace, pre-philosophical beliefs. Nonetheless, and despite confessing that other philosophers rather than the world prompted his philosophizing (Schilpp 1942: 14), Moore held that philosophy should give ‘a general description of the whole Universe’ (1953: 1). Accordingly, Moore tackled ethics and aesthetics as well as epistemology and metaphysics. His Principia Ethica used the not-especially-commonsensical idea that goodness was a simple, indefinable quality in order to defend the meaningfulness of ethical statements and the objectivity of moral value. Additionally, Moore advanced a normative ethic, the wider social or political implications of which are debated (Hutchinson 2001).

Russell’s tendency to exclude ethics from philosophy, and Wittgenstein’s protective version of the exclusion, are contentious and presuppose their respective versions of atomism. In turn, that atomism relies heavily upon the idea, as meta­philosophical as it is philosophical, of an ideal language (or at least of an ideal analysis of natural language). Later sections criticize that idea. Such criticism finds little target in Moore. Yet Moore is a target for those who hold that philosophy should be little concerned with words or even, perhaps, with concepts (see section 2.c and the ‘revivals’ treated in section 2.d).

b. Logical Positivism

We witness the spirit of the scientific world-conception penetrating in growing measure the forms of personal and public life, in education, upbringing, architecture, and the shaping of economic and social life according to rational principles. The scientific world-conception serves life, and life receives it. The task of philosophical work lies in [...] clarification of problems and assertions, not in the propounding of special “philosophical” pronouncements. The method of this clarification is that of logical analysis.

The foregoing passages owe to a manifesto issued by the Vienna Circle (Neurath, Carnap, and Hahn 1973: 317f. and 328). Leading members of that Circle included Moritz Schlick (a physicist turned philosopher), Rudolf Carnap (primarily a logician), and Otto Neurath (economist, sociologist, and philosopher). These thinkers were inspired by the original positivist, Auguste Comte. Other influences included the empiricism(s) of Hume, Russell and Ernst Mach, and the Russell–Wittgenstein idea of an ideal logical language. (The Tractatus, in particular, was a massive influence.) The Circle, in turn, gave rise to an international movement that went under several names: logical positivism, logical empiricism, neopositivism, and simply positivism.

The clarification or logical analysis advocated by positivism is two-sided. Its destructive task was the use of the so-called verifiability principle to eliminate metaphysics. According to that principle, a statement is meaningful only when either true by definition or verifiable through experience. (So there is no synthetic apriori. See Kant, Metaphysics, section 2, and A Priori and A Posteriori.) The positivists placed mathematics and logic within the true-by-definition (or analytic apriori) category, and science and most normal talk in the category of verifiable-through-experience (or synthetic aposteriori). All else was deemed meaningless. That fate befell metaphysical statements and finds its most famous illustration in Carnap’s attack (1931) on Heidegger’s ‘What is Metaphysics?’ It was the fate, too, of ethical and aesthetic statements. Hence the non-cognitivist meta-ethics (see Ethics, section 1) that some positivists developed.

The constructive side of positivistic analysis involved epistemology and philosophy of science. The positivists wanted to know exactly how experience justified empirical knowledge. Sometimes – the positivists took a variety of positions on that question – the idea was to reduce all scientific statements to those of physics. (See Reductionism.) That effort went under the heading of ‘unified science’. So too did an idea that sought to make good on the claim that positivism ‘served life’. That idea was that the sciences should collaborate in order to help solve social problems, a project championed by the so-called Left Vienna Circle and, within that, especially by Neurath (who served in a socialist Munich government and, later, was a central figure in Austrian housing movements). The positivists had close relations with the Bauhaus movement, which was itself understood by its members as socially progressive (Galison 1990).

Positivism had its problems and its detractors. The believer in ‘special philosophical pronouncements’ will think that positivism decapitates philosophy (compare section 4.a below, on Husserl). Moreover, positivism itself seemingly involved at least one ‘special’ – read: metaphysical – pronouncement, namely, the verifiability principle. Further, there is reason to distrust the very idea of providing strict criteria for nonsense (see Glendinning 2001). Further yet, the idea of an ideal logical language was attacked as unachievable, incoherent, and/or – when used as a means to certify philosophical truth – circular (Copi 1949). There were doubts, too, about whether positivism really ‘served life’. (1) Might positivism’s narrow notion of fact prevent it from comprehending the real nature of society? (Critical Theory leveled that objection. See O’Neill and Uebel 2004.) (2) Might positivism involve a disastrous reduction of politics to the discovery of technical solutions to depoliticized ends? (This objection owes again to Critical Theory, but also to others. See Galison 1990 and O’Neill 2003.)

Positivism retained some coherence as a movement or doctrine until the late 1960s, even though the Nazis – with whom the positivists clashed – forced the Circle into exile. In fact, that exile helped to spread the positivist creed. But, not long after the Second World War, the ascendancy that positivism had acquired in Anglophone philosophy began to diminish. It did so partly because of the developments to be considered next.

c. Ordinary Language Philosophy and the Later Wittgenstein

Some accounts group ordinary language philosophy and the philosophy of the later Wittgenstein (and of Wittgenstein’s disciples) together – under the title ‘linguistic philosophy’. That grouping can mislead. All previous Analytic philosophy was centrally concerned with language. In that sense, all previous Analytic philosophy had taken the so-called ‘linguistic turn’ (see Rorty 1992). Nevertheless, ordinary language philosophy and the later Wittgenstein do mark a change. They twist the linguistic turn away from logical or constructed languages and towards ordinary (that is, vernacular) language, or at least towards natural (non-artificial) language. Thereby the new bodies of thought represent a movement away from Russell, the early Wittgenstein, and the positivists (and back, to an extent, towards Moore). In short – and as many accounts of the history of Analytic philosophy put it – we have here a shift from ideal language philosophy to ordinary language philosophy.

Ordinary language philosophy began with and centrally comprised a loose grouping of philosophers among whom the Oxford dons Gilbert Ryle and J. L. Austin loomed largest. The following view united these philosophers. Patient analysis of the meaning of words can tap the rich distinctions of natural languages and minimize the unclarities, equivocations and conflations to which philosophers are prone. So construed, philosophy is unlike natural science and even, insofar as it avoided systematization, unlike linguistics. The majority of ordinary language philosophers did hold, with Austin, that such analysis was not the ‘the last word’ in philosophy. Specialist knowledge and techniques can in principle everywhere augment and improve it. But natural or ordinary language ‘is the first word’ (Austin 1979: 185; see also Analytic Philosophy, section 4a).

The later Wittgenstein did hold, or at least came close to holding, that ordinary language has the last word in philosophy. This later Wittgenstein retained his earlier view that philosophy was a critique of language – of language that tried to be metaphysical or philosophical. But he abandoned the idea (itself problematically metaphysical) that there was one true form to language. He came to think, instead, that all philosophical problems owe to ‘misinterpretation of our forms of language’ (Wittgenstein 2001: section 111). They owe to misunderstanding of the ways language actually works. A principal cause of such misunderstanding, Wittgenstein thought, is misassimilation of expressions one to another. Such misassimilation can be motivated, in turn, by a ‘craving for generality’ (Wittgenstein 1975: 17ff.) that is inspired by science. The later Wittgenstein’s own philosophizing means to be a kind of therapy for philosophers, a therapy which will liberate them from their problems by showing how, in their very formulations of those problems, their words have ceased to make sense. Wittgenstein tries to show how the words that give philosophers trouble – words such as ‘know’, ‘mind’, and ‘sensation’ – become problematical only when, in philosophers’ hands, they depart from the uses and the contexts that give them meaning. Thus a sense in which philosophy ‘leaves everything as it is’ (2001: section 124). ‘[W]e must do away with all explanation, and description alone must take its place’ (section 124). Still, Wittgenstein himself once asked, ‘[W]hat is the use of studying philosophy if all that it does for you is to enable you to talk with some plausibility about some abstruse questions of logic, etc. [...]’? (cited in Malcolm 1984: 35 and 93). And in one sense Wittgenstein did not want to leave everything as it was. To wit: he wanted to end the worship of science. For the view that science could express all genuine truths was, he held, barbarizing us by impoverishing our understanding of the world and of ourselves.

Much meta­philosophical flack has been aimed at the later Wittgenstein and ordinary language philosophy. They have been accused of: abolishing practical philosophy; rendering philosophy uncritical; trivializing philosophy by making it a mere matter of words; enshrining the ignorance of common speech; and, in Wittgenstein’s case – and in his own words (taken out of context) – of ‘destroy[ing] everything interesting’ (2001: section 118; on these criticisms see Russell 1995: ch. 18, Marcuse 1991: ch. 7 and Gellner 2005). Nonetheless, it is at least arguable that these movements of thought permanently changed Analytic philosophy by making it more sensitive to linguistic nuance and to the oddities of philosophical language. Moreover, some contemporary philosophers have defended more or less Wittgensteinian conceptions of philosophy. One such philosopher is Peter Strawson (on whom see section 2.d.iii). Another is Stanley Cavell. Note also that some writers have attempted to develop the more practical side of Wittgenstein’s thought (Pitkin 1993, Cavell 1979).

d. Three Revivals

Between the 1950s and the 1970s, there were three significant, and persisting, meta­philosophical developments within the Analytic tradition.

i. Normative Philosophy including Rawls and Practical Ethics

During positivism’s ascendancy, and for some time thereafter, substantive normative issues – questions about how one should live, what sort of government is best or legitimate, and so on – were widely deemed quasi-philosophical. Positivism’s non-cognitivism was a major cause. So was the distrust, in the later Wittgenstein and in ordinary language philosophy, of philosophical theorizing. This neglect of the normative had its exceptions. But the real change occurred with the appearance, in 1971, of A Theory of Justice by John Rawls.

Many took Rawls' book to show, through its ‘systematicity and clarity’, that normative theory was possible ‘without loss of rigor’ (Weithman 2003: 6). Rawls' procedure for justifying normative principles is of particular metaphilosophical note. That procedure, called ‘reflective equilibrium’, has three steps. (The quotations that follow are from Schroeter 2004.)

  1. ‘[W]e elicit the moral judgments of competent moral judges’ on whatever topic is at issue. (In Theories of Justice itself, distributive justice was the topic.) Thereby we obtain ‘a set of considered judgments, in which we have strong confidence’.
  2. ‘[W]e construct a scheme of explicit principles, which will ‘‘explicate’’, ‘‘fit’’, ‘‘match’’ or ‘‘account for’’ the set of considered judgments.’
  3. By moving ‘back and forth between the initial judgments and the principles, making the adjustments which seem the most plausible’, ‘we remove any discrepancy which might remain between the judgments derived from the scheme of principles and the initial considered judgments’, thereby achieving ‘a point of equilibrium, where principles and judgments coincide’.

The conception of reflective equilibrium was perhaps less philosophically orthodox than most readers of Theory of Justice believed. For Rawls came to argue that his conception of justice was, or should be construed as, ‘political not metaphysical’ (Rawls 1999b: 47–72). A political conception of justice ‘stays on the surface, philosophically speaking’ (Rawls 1999b: 395). It appeals only to that which ‘given our history and the traditions embedded in our public life [...] is the most reasonable doctrine for us’ (p. 307). A metaphysical conception of justice appeals to something beyond such contingencies. However: despite advocating the political conception, Rawls appeals to an ‘overlapping consensus’ (his term) of metaphysical doctrines. The idea here, or hope, is this (Rawls, section 3; Freeman 2007: 324–415). Citizens in modern democracies hold various and not fully inter-compatible political and social ideas. But those citizens will be able to unite in supporting a liberal conception of justice.

Around the same time as Theory of Justice appeared, a parallel revival in normative philosophy begun. This was the rise of practical ethics. Here is how one prominent practical ethicist presents ‘the most plausible explanation’ for that development. ‘[L]aw, ethics, and many of the professions—including medicine, business, engineering, and scientific research—were profoundly and permanently affected by issues and concerns in the wider society regarding individual liberties, social equality, and various forms of abuse and injustice that date from the late 1950s’ (Beauchamp 2002: 133f.). Now the new ethicists, who insisted that philosophy should treat ‘real problems’ (Beauchamp 2002: 134), did something largely foreign to previous Analytic philosophy (and to that extent did not, in fact, constitute a revival). They applied moral theory to such concrete and pressing matters as racism, sexual equality, abortion, governance and war. (On those problems, see Ethics, section 3).

According to some practical ethicists, moral principles are not only applied to, but also drawn from, cases. The issue here – the relation between theory and its application – broadened out into a more thoroughly metaphilosophical debate. For, soon after Analytic philosophers had returned to normative ethics, some of them rejected a prevalent conception of normative ethical theory, and others entirely rejected such theory. The first camp rejects moral theory qua ‘decision procedure for moral reasoning’ (Williams 1981: ix-x) but does not foreclose other types of normative theory such as virtue ethics. The second and more radical camp holds that the moral world is too complex for any (prescriptive) codification that warrants the name ‘theory’. (On these positions, see Lance and Little 2006, Clarke 1987, Chappell 2009.)

ii. History of Philosophy

For a long time, most analytic philosophers held that the history of philosophy had little to do with doing philosophy. For what – they asked - was the history of philosophy save, largely, a series of mistakes? We might learn from those mistakes, and the history might contain some occasional insights. But (the line of thought continues) we should be wary of resurrecting the mistakes and beware the archive fever that leads to the idea that there is no such thing as philosophical progress. But in the 1970s a more positive attitude to the history of philosophy began to emerge, together with an attempt to reinstate or re-legitimate serious historical scholarship within philosophy (compare Analytic Philosophy section 5.c).

The newly positive attitude towards the history of philosophy was premised on the view that the study of past philosophies was of significant philosophical value. Reasons adduced for that view include the following (Sorell and Rogers 2005). History of philosophy can disclose our assumptions. It can show the strengths of positions that we find uncongenial. It can suggest rolesthat philosophy might take today by revealing ways in which philosophy has been embedded in a wider intellectual and sociocultural frameworks. A more radical view, espoused by Charles Taylor (1984: 17) is that, ‘Philosophy and the history of philosophy are one’; ‘we cannot do the first without also doing the second.’

Many Analytical philosophers continue to regard the study of philosophy’s history as very much secondary to philosophy itself. By contrast, many so-called Continental philosophers take the foregoing ideas, including the more radical view – which is associated with Hegel – as axiomatic. (See much of section 4, below.)

iii. Metaphysics: Strawson, Quine, Kripke

Positivism, the later Wittgenstein, and Ordinary Language Philosophy suppressed Analytic metaphysics. Yet it recovered, thanks especially to three figures, beginning with Peter Strawson.

Strawson had his origins in the ordinary language tradition and he declares a large debt or affinity to Wittgenstein (Strawson 2003: 12). But he is indebted, also, to Kant; and, with Strawson, ordinary language philosophy became more systematic and more ambitious. However, Strawson retained an element of what one might call, in Rae Langton’s phrase, Kantian humility. In order to understand these characterizations, one needs to appreciate that which Strawson advocated under the heading of ‘descriptive metaphysics’. In turn, descriptive metaphysics is best approached via that which Strawson called ‘connective analysis’.

Connective analysis seeks to elucidate concepts by discerning their interconnections, which is to say, the ways in which concepts variously imply, presuppose, and exclude one another. Strawson contrasts this ‘connective model’ with ‘the reductive or atomistic model’ that aims ‘to dismantle or reduce the concepts we examine to other and simpler concepts’ (all Strawson 1991: 21). The latter model is that of Russell, the Tractatus, and, indeed, Moore. Another way in which Strawson departs from Russell and the Tractatus, but not from Moore, lies in this: a principal method of connective analysis is ‘close examination of the actual use of words’ (Strawson 1959: 9). But when Strawson turns to ‘descriptive metaphysics’, such examination is not enough.

Descriptive metaphysics is, or proceeds via, a very general form of connective analysis. The goal here is ‘to lay bare the most general features of our conceptual structure’ (Strawson 1959: 9). Those most general features – our most general concepts – have a special importance. For those concepts, or at least those of them in which Strawson is most interested, are (he thinks) basic or fundamental in the following sense. They are (1) irreducible, (2) unchangeable in that they comprise ‘a massive central core of human thinking which has no history’ (1959: 10) and (3) necessary to ‘any conception of experience which we can make intelligible to ourselves’ (Strawson 1991: 26). And the structure that these concepts comprise ‘does not readily display itself on the surface of language, but lies submerged’ (1956: 9f.).

Descriptive metaphysics is considerably Kantian (see Kant, metaphysics). Strawson is Kantian, too, in rejecting what he calls ‘revisionary metaphysics’. Here we have the element of Kantian ‘humility’ within Strawson’s enterprise. Descriptive metaphysics ‘is content to describe the actual structure of our thought about the world’, whereas revisionary metaphysics aims ‘to produce a better structure’ (Strawson 1959: 9; my stress). Strawson urges several points against revisionary metaphysics.

  1. A revisionary metaphysic is apt to be an overgeneralization of some particular aspect of our conceptual scheme and/or
  2. to be a confusion between conceptions of how things really are with some Weltanschauung.
  3. Revisionary metaphysics attempts the impossible, namely, to depart from the fundamental features of our conceptual scheme. The first point shows the influence of Wittgenstein. So does the third, although it is also (as Strawson may have recognized) somewhat Heideggerian. The second point is reminiscent of Carnap’s version of logical positivism. All this notwithstanding, and consistently enough, Strawson held that systems of revisionary metaphysics can, through the ‘partial vision’ (1959: 9) that they provide, be useful to descriptive metaphysics.

Here are some worries about Strawson’s metaphilosophy. ‘[T]he conceptual system with which “we” are operating may be much more changing, relative, and culturally limited than Strawson assumes it to be’ (Burtt 1963: 35). Next: Strawson imparts very little about the method(s) of descriptive metaphysics (although one might try to discern techniques – in which imagination seems to play a central role – from his actual analyses). More serious is that Strawson imparts little by way of answer to the following questions. ‘What is a concept? How are concepts individuated? What is a conceptual scheme? How are conceptual schemes individuated? What is the relation between a language and a conceptual scheme?’ (Haack 1979: 366f.). Further: why believe that the analytic philosopher has no business providing ‘new and revealing vision[s]’ (Strawson 1992: 2)? At any rate, Strawson helped those philosophers who rejected reductive (especially Russellian and positivistic) versions of analysis but who wanted to continue to call themselves ‘analytic’. For he gave them a reasonably narrow conception of analysis to which they could adhere (Beaney 2009: section 8; compare Glock 2008: 159). Finally note that, despite his criticisms of Strawson, the contemporary philosopher Peter Hacker defends a metaphilosophy rather similar to descriptive metaphysics (Hacker 2003 and 2007).

William Van Orman Quine was a second prime mover in the metaphysical revival. Quine’s metaphysics, which is revisionary in Strawson’s terms, emerged from Quine’s attack upon ‘two dogmas of modern empiricism’. Those ostensible dogmas are: (1) ‘belief in some fundamental cleavage between truths that are analytic, or grounded in meanings independently of matters of fact, and truths that are synthetic, or grounded in fact’; (2) ‘reductionism: the belief that each meaningful statement is equivalent to some logical construction upon terms which refer to immediate experience’ (Quine 1980: 20). Against 1, Quine argues that every belief has some connection to experience. Against 2, he argues that the connection is never direct. For when experience clashes with some belief, which belief(s) must be changed is underdetermined. Beliefs ‘face the tribunal of sense experience not individually but as a corporate body’ (p. 41; see Evidence section 3.c.i). Quine expresses this holistic and radically empiricist conception by speaking of ‘the web of belief’. Some beliefs – those near the ‘edge of the web’ – are more exposed to experience than others; but the interlinking of beliefs is such that no belief is immune to experience.

Quine saves metaphysics from positivism. More judiciously put: Quine’s conception, if correct, saves metaphysics from the verifiability criterion (q.v. section 2.b). For the notion of the web of belief implies that ontological beliefs – beliefs about ‘the most general traits of reality’ (Quine 1960: 161) – are answerable to experience. And, if that is so, then ontological beliefs differ from other beliefs only in their generality. Quine infers that, ‘Ontological questions [...] are on a par with questions of natural science’ (1980: 45). In fact, since Quine thinks that natural science, and in particular physics, is the best way of fitting our beliefs to reality, he infers that ontology should be determined by the best available comprehensive scientific theory. In that sense, metaphysics is ‘the metaphysics of science’ (Glock 2003a: 30).

Is the metaphysics of science actually only science? Quine asserts that ‘it is only within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described’ (1981: 21). Yet he does leave a job for the philosopher. The philosopher is to translate the best available scientific theory into that which Quine called ‘canonical notation’, namely, ‘the language of modern logic as developed by Frege, Peirce, Russell and others’ (Orenstein 2002: 16). Moreover, the philosopher is to make the translation in such a way as to minimize the theory’s ontological commitments. Only after such a translation, which Quine calls ‘explication’ can one say, at a philosophical level: ‘that is What There Is’. (However, Quine cannot fully capitalize those letters, as it were. For he thinks that there is a pragmatic element to ontology. See section 3.a below.) This role for philosophy is a reduced one. For one thing, it deprives philosophy of something traditionally considered one of its greatest aspirations: necessary truth. On Quine’s conception, no truth can be absolutely necessary. (That holds even for the truths of Quine’s beloved logic, since they, too, fall within the web of belief.) By contrast, even Strawson and the positivists – the latter in the form of ‘analytic truth’ – had countenanced versions of necessary truth.

Saul Kripke - the third important reviver of metaphysics - allows the philosopher a role that is perhaps slightly more distinct than Quine does. Kripke does that precisely by propounding a new notion of necessity. (That said, some identify Ruth Barcan Marcus as the discoverer of the necessity at issue.) According to Kripke (1980), a truth T about X is necessary just when T holds in all possible worlds that contain X. To explain: science shows us that, for example, water is composed of H20; the philosophical question is whether that truth holds of all possible worlds (all possible worlds in which water exists) and is thereby necessary. Any such science-derived necessities are aposteriori just because, and in the sense that, they are (partially) derived from science.

Aposteriori necessity is a controversial idea. Kripke realizes this. But he asks why it is controversial. The notions of the apriori and aposteriori are epistemological (they are about whether or not one needs to investigate the world in order to know something), whereas – Kripke points out – his notion of necessity is ontological (that is, about whether things could be otherwise). As to how one determines whether a truth obtains in all possible worlds, Kripke’s main appeal is to the intuitions of philosophers. The next subsection somewhat scrutinizes that appeal, together with some of the other ideas of this subsection.

e. Naturalism including Experimentalism and Its Challenge to Intuitions

Kripke and especially Quine helped to create, particularly in the United States, a new orthodoxy within Analytic philosophy. That orthodoxy is naturalism or - the term used by its detractors - scientism. But naturalism (/scientism) is no one thing (Glock 2003a: 46; compare Papineau 2009). Ontological naturalism holds that the entities treated by natural science exhaust reality. Meta­philosophical naturalism – which is the focus in what follows – asserts a strong continuity between philosophy and science. A common construal of that continuity runs thus. Philosophical problems are in one way or another ‘tractable through the methods of the empirical sciences’ (Naturalism, Introduction). Now, within meta­philosophical naturalism, one can distinguish empirical philosophers from experimental philosophers (Prinz 2008). Empirical philosophers enlist science to answer, or to help answer, philosophical problems. Experimental philosophers (or ‘experimentalists’) themselves do science, or do so in collaboration with scientists. Let us start with empirical philosophy.

Quine is an empirical philosopher in his approach to metaphysics and even more so in his approach to epistemology. Quine presents and urges his epistemology thus: ‘The stimulation of his sensory receptors is all the evidence anybody has had to go on, ultimately, in arriving at his picture of the world. Why not just see how this construction really proceeds? Why not settle for psychology?’ (Quine 1977: 75). Such naturalistic epistemology – in Quine’s own formulation, ‘naturalized epistemology’ – has been extended to moral epistemology. ‘A naturalized moral epistemology is simply a naturalized epistemology that concerns itself with moral knowledge’ (Campbell and Hunter 2000: 1). There is such a thing, too, as naturalized aesthetics: the attempt to use science to solve aesthetical problems (McMahon 2007). Other forms of empirical philosophy include neurophilosophy, which applies methods from neuroscience, and sometimes computer science, to questions in the philosophy of mind.

Naturalized epistemology has been criticized for being insufficiently normative. How can descriptions of epistemic mechanisms determine license for belief? The difficulty seems especially pressing in the case of moral epistemology. Wittgenstein’s complaint against naturalistic aesthetics – a view he called ‘exceedingly stupid’ – may intend a similar point. ‘The sort of explanation one is looking for when one is puzzled by an aesthetic impression is not a causal explanation, not one corroborated by experience or by statistics as to how people react’ (all Wittgenstein 1966: 17, 21). A wider disquiet about meta­philosophical naturalism is this: it presupposes a controversial view explicitly endorsed by Quine, namely that science alone provides true or good knowledge (Glock 2003a: 28, 46). For that reason and for others, some philosophers, including Wittgenstein, are suspicious even of scientifically-informed philosophy of mind.

Now the experimentalists – the philosophers who actually do science – tend to use science not to propose new philosophical ideas or theories but rather to investigate existing philosophical claims. The philosophical claims at issue are based upon intuitions, intuitions being something like ‘seemings’ or spontaneous judgments. Sometimes philosophers have employed intuitions in support of empirical claims. For example, some ethicists have asserted, from their philosophical armchairs, that character is the most significant determinant of action. Another example: some philosophers have speculated that most people are ‘incompatibilists’ about determinism. (The claim in this second example is, though empirical, construable as a certain type of second-order intuition, namely, as a claim that is empirical, yet made from the armchair, about the intuitions that other people have.) Experimentalists have put such hunches to the test, often concluding that they are mistaken (see Levin 2009 and Levy 2009). At other times, though, the type of intuitively-based claim that experimentalists investigate is non-empirical or at least not evidently empirical. Here one finds, for instance, intuitions about what counts as knowledge, about whether some feature of something is necessary to it (recall Kripke, above), about what the best resolution of a moral dilemma is, and about whether or not we have free will. Now, experimentalists have not quite tested claims of this second sort. But they have used empirical methods in interrogating the ways in which philosophers, in considering such claims, have employed intuitions. Analytic philosophers have been wont to use their intuitions about such non-empirical matters to establish burdens of proof, to support premises, and to serve as data against which to test philosophical theories. But experimentalists have claimed to find that, at least in the case of non-philosophers, intuitions about such matters vary considerably. (See for instance Weinberg, Nichols and Stitch 2001.) So, why privilege the intuitions of some particular philosopher?

Armchair philosophers have offered various responses. One is that philosophers’ intuitions diverge from ‘folk’ intuitions only in this way: the former are more considered versions of the latter (Levin 2009). But might not such considered intuitions vary among themselves? Moreover: why at all trust even considered intuitions? Why not think – with Quine (and William James, Richard Rorty, Nietzsche, and others) that intuitions are sedimentations of culturally or biologically inherited views? A traditional response to that last question (an ‘ordinary language response’ and equally, perhaps, ‘an ideal language’ response) runs as follows. Intuitions do not convey views of the world. Rather they convey an implicit knowledge of concepts or of language. A variation upon that reply gives it a more naturalistic gloss. The idea here is that (considered) intuitions, though indeed ‘synthetic’ and, as such, defeasible, represent good prima facie evidence for the philosophical views at issue, at least if those views are about the nature of concepts (see for instance Graham and Horgan 1994).

3. Pragmatism, Neopragmatism, and Post-Analytic Philosophy

a. Pragmatism

The original or classical pragmatists are the North Americans C.S. Peirce (1839–1914), William James (1842–1910), John Dewey (1859–1952) and, perhaps, G. H. Mead. The metaphilosophy of pragmatism unfolds from that which became known as ‘the pragmatic maxim’.

Peirce invented the pragmatic maxim as a tool for clarifying ideas. His best known formulation of the maxim runs thus: ‘Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object’ (Peirce 1931-58, volume 5: section 402). Sometimes the maxim reveals an idea to have no meaning. Such was the result, Peirce thought, of applying the maxim to transubstantiation, and, indeed, to many metaphysical ideas. Dewey deployed the maxim similarly. He saw it ‘as a method for inoculating ourselves against certain blind alleys in philosophy’ (Talisse and Aikin 2008: 17). James construed the maxim differently. Whereas Peirce seemed to hold that the ‘effects’ at issue were, solely, effects upon sensory experience, James extended those effects into the psychological effects of believing in the idea(s) in question. Moreover, whereas Peirce construed the maxim as a conception of meaning, James turned it into a conception of truth. ‘“The true”’ is that which, ‘in almost any fashion’, but ‘in the long run and on the whole’, is ‘expedient in the way of our thinking’ (James 1995: 86). As a consequence of these moves, James thought that many philosophical disputes were resolvable, and were only resolvable, through the pragmatic maxim.

None of the pragmatists opposed metaphysics as such or as a whole. That may be because each of them held that philosophy is not fundamentally different to other inquiries. Each of Peirce, James and Dewey elaborates the notion of inquiry, and the relative distinctiveness of philosophy, in his own way. But there is common ground on two views. (1) Inquiry is a matter of coping. Dewey, and to an extent James, understand inquiry as an organism trying to cope with its environment. Indeed Dewey was considerably influenced by Darwin. (2) Experimental science is the exemplar of inquiry. One finds this second idea in Dewey but also and especially in Peirce. The idea is that experimental science is the best method or model of inquiry, be the inquiry practical or theoretical, descriptive or normative, philosophical or non-philosophical. ‘Pragmatism as attitude represents what Mr. Peirce has happily termed the “laboratory habit of mind” extended into every area where inquiry may fruitfully be carried on’ (Dewey 1998, volume 2: 378). Each of these views (that is, both 1 and 2) may be called naturalistic (the second being a version of metaphilosophical naturalism; q.v. section 2.e).

According to pragmatism (though Peirce is perhaps an exception) pragmatism was a humanism. Its purpose was to serve humanity. Here is James (1995: 2): ‘no one of us can get along without the far-flashing beams of light it sends over the world’s perspectives’, the ‘it’ here being pragmatist philosophy and also philosophy in general. James held further that pragmatism, this time in contrast with some other philosophies, allows the universe to appear as ‘a place in which human thoughts, choices, and aspirations count for something’ (Gallie 1952: 24). As to Dewey, he held the following. ‘Ideals and values must be evaluated with respect to their social consequences, either as inhibitors or as valuable instruments for social progress’; and ‘philosophy, because of the breadth of its concern and its critical approach, can play a crucial role in this evaluation’ (Dewey, section 4). Indeed, according to Dewey, philosophy is to be ‘a social hope reduced to a working programme of action, a prophecy of the future, but one disciplined by serious thought and knowledge’ (Dewey 1998, vol. 1: 72). Dewey himself pursued such a programme, and not only in his writing – in which he championed a pervasive form of democracy – but also (and to help enable such democracy) as an educationalist.

Humanism notwithstanding, pragmatism was not hostile to religion. Dewey could endorse religion as a means of articulating our highest values. James tended to hold that the truth of religious ideas was to be determined, at the broadest level, in the same way as the truth of anything else. Peirce, for his part, was a more traditional philosophical theist. The conceptions of religion advocated by James and Dewey have been criticized for being very much reconceptions (Talisse and Aikin 2008: 90–94). A broader objection to pragmatist humanism is that its making of man the measure of all things is false and even pernicious. One finds versions of that objection in Heidegger and Critical Theory. One could level the charge, too, from the perspective of environmental ethics. Rather differently, and even more broadly, one might think that ‘moral and political ambitions’ have no place ‘within philosophy proper’ (Glock 2003a: 22 glossing Quine). Objections of a more specific kind have targeted the pragmatic maxim. Critics have faulted Peirce’s version of the pragmatic maxim for being too narrow or too indeterminate; and Russell and others have criticized James' version as a misanalysis of what we mean by ‘true’.

Pragmatism was superseded (most notably in the United States) or occluded (in those places where it took little hold in the first place) by logical positivism. But the metaphilosophy of logical positivism has important similarities to pragmatism’s. Positivism’s verifiability principle is very similar to Peirce’s maxim. The positivists held that science is the exemplar of inquiry. And the positivists, like pragmatism, aimed at the betterment of society. Note also that positivism itself dissolved partly because its original tenets underwent a ‘“pragmaticization”’ (Rorty 1991b: xviii). That pragmaticization was the work especially of Quine and Davidson, who are ‘logical pragmatists’ in that they use logical techniques to develop some of the main ideas of pragmatists (Glock 2003a: 22–3; see also Rynin 1956). The ideas at issue include epistemological holism and the underdetermination of various type of theory by evidence. The latter is the aforementioned (section 2.d.iii) pragmatic element within Quine’s approach to ontology (on which see further Quine’s Philosophy of Science, section 3).

b. Neopragmatism: Rorty

The label ‘neopragmatism’ has been applied to Robert Brandom, Susan Haack, Nicholas Rescher, Richard Rorty, and other thinkers who, like them, identify themselves with some part(s) of classical pragmatism. (Karl-Otto Apel, Jürgen Habermas, John McDowell, and Hilary Putnam are borderline cases; each takes much from pragmatism but is wary about ‘pragmatist’ as a self-description.) This section concentrates upon the best known, most controversial, and possibly the most meta­philosophical, of the neopragmatists: Rorty.

Much of Rorty’s meta­philosophy issues from his antirepresentationalism. Antirepresentationalism is, in the first instance, this view: no representation (linguistic or mental conception) corresponds to reality in a way that exceeds our commonsensical and scientific notions of what it is to get the world right. Rorty’s arguments against the sort of privileged representations that are at issue here terminate or summarize as follows. ‘[N]othing counts as justification unless by reference to what we already accept [...] [T]here is no way to get outside our beliefs and our language so as to find some test other than coherence’ (Rorty 1980: 178). Rorty infers that ‘the notion of “representation,” or that of “fact of the matter,”’ has no ‘useful role in philosophy’ (Rorty 1991b: 2). We are to conceive ourselves, or our conceptions, not as answerable to the world, but only to our fellows (see McDowell 2000: 110).

Rorty thinks that antirepresentationalism entails the rejection of a metaphilosophy which goes back to the Greeks, found a classic expression in Kant, and which is pursued in Analytic philosophy. That metaphilosophy, which Rorty calls ‘epistemological’, presents philosophy as ‘a tribunal of pure reason, upholding or denying the claims of the rest of culture’ (Rorty 1980: 4). More fully: philosophy judges discourses, be they religious, scientific, moral, political, aesthetical or metaphysical, by seeing which of them, and to what degree, disclose reality as it really is. (Clearly, though, more needs to be said if this conception is to accommodate Kant’s ‘transcendental idealism’. See Kant: Metaphysics, section 4.)

Rorty wants the philosopher to be, not a ‘cultural overseer’ adjudicating types of truth claims, but an ‘informed dilettante’ and a ‘Socratic intermediary’ (Rorty 1980: 317). That is, the philosopher is to elicit ‘agreement, or, at least, exciting and fruitful disagreement’ (Rorty 1980: 318) between or within various types or areas of discourse. Philosophy so conceived Rorty calls ‘hermeneutics’. The Rortian philosopher does not seek some schema allowing two or more discourses to be translated perfectly one to the other (an idea Rorty associates with representationalism). Instead she inhabits hermeneutic circle. ‘[W]e play back and forth between guesses about how to characterize particular statements or other events, and guesses about the point of the whole situation, until gradually we feel at ease with what was hitherto strange’ (1980: 319). Rorty connects this procedure to the ‘edification’ that consists in ‘finding new, better, more interesting, more fruitful ways of speaking’ (p. 360) and, thereby, to a goal he calls ‘existentialist’: the goal of finding new types of self-conception and, in that manner, finding new ways to be.

Rorty’s elaboration of all this introduces further notable meta­philosophical views. First: ‘Blake is as much of a philosopher Fichte and Henry Adams more of a philosopher than Frege’ (Rorty 1991a: xv). For Sellars was right, Rorty believes, to define philosophy as ‘an attempt to see how things, in the broadest possible sense of the term, hang together, in the broadest possible sense of the term’ (Sellars 1963: 1; compare section 6, Sellars’ Philosophy of Mind; presumably, though, Rorty holds that one has good philosophy when such attempts prove ‘edifying’). Second: what counts as a philosophical problem is contingent, and not just in that people only discover certain philosophical problems at certain times. Third: philosophical argument, at least when it aspires to be conclusive, requires shared assumptions; where there are no or few shared assumptions, such argument is impossible.

The last of the foregoing ideas is important for what one might call Rorty’s practical metaphilosophy. Rorty maintains that one can argue about morals and/or politics only with someone with whom one shares some assumptions. The neutral ground that philosophy has sought for debates with staunch egoists and unbending totalitarians is a fantasy. All the philosopher can do, besides point that out, is to create a conception that articulates, but does not strictly support, his or her moral or political vision. The philosopher ought to be ‘putting politics first and tailoring a philosophy to suit’ (Rorty 1991b: 178) – and similarly for morality. Rorty thinks that no less a political philosopher than John Rawls has already come close to this stance (Rorty 1991b: 191). Nor does Rorty bemoan any of this. The ‘cultural politics’ which suggests ‘changes in the vocabularies deployed in moral and political deliberation’ (Rorty 2007: ix) is more useful than the attempt to find philosophical foundations for some such vocabulary. The term ‘cultural politics’ could mislead, though. Rorty does not advocate an exclusive concentration on cultural as against social or economic issues. He deplores the sort of philosophy or cultural or literary theory that makes it ‘almost impossible to clamber back down [...] to a level [...] on which one might discuss the merits of a law, a treaty, a candidate, or a political strategy’ (Rorty 2007: 93).

Rorty’s metaphilosophy, and the philosophical views with which it is intertwined, have been attacked as irrationalist, self-refuting, relativist, unduly ethnocentric, complacent, anti-progressive, and even as insincere. Ev