Category Archives: Feminist Philosophy

Gender in Chinese Philosophy

The concept of gender is foundational to the general approach of Chinese thinkers. Yin and yang, core elements of Chinese cosmogony, involve correlative aspects of “dark and light,” “female and male,” and “soft and hard.” These notions, with their deeply-rooted gender connotations, recognize the necessity of interplay between these different forces in generating and carrying forward the world. The major thinkers of China’s first philosophic flourishing—traditionally referred to as the Hundred Schools, c. 500s-200s B.C.E.—inherited and further developed this comprehensively gendered view of the world. These concepts continue to shape contemporary Chinese thought, as well. Historically, the most influential Chinese perspectives on the issue of gender come from what are commonly referred to as Confucian and Daoist traditions of thought, which take somewhat opposing positions. Many texts associated with Confucianism emphasize yang’s dominant, male-related characteristics, whereas those linked to Daoism, especially the Laozi, reverse this view, finding value in yin’s subordinate, female characteristics. However, it should be noted that Chinese thinkers, regardless of their classification as Confucian or Daoist, generally see the opposing qualities of yin and yang as integral parts of a whole that complement one another. Accordingly, the closest word to “gender” in modern Chinese is xingbie, which can be quite literally understood as a difference (bie) of individual nature or tendencies (xing). The word generally, however, refers to the physiological characteristics that then provide the basis for corresponding social identities. The genders, in terms of social roles, are not defined absolutely or theoretically, but rather through the mutually reciprocal, physical, generative relationship between male and female. They are understood correlatively, and determined by their context and dynamic tendencies as they interact with one another. Such traditions within Chinese thought may be applied as resources for contemporary feminist philosophy, albeit not without considerable caution.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Human Tendencies (Nature) and Gender
  3. Gender Cosmology
  4. Gender and Social Order
  5. Family Patterns
  6. Chinese Cultural Resources for Feminism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

There is a debate in contemporary Chinese academic circles about whether or not the idea of “gender” or “gender concepts” actually applies to traditional Chinese thought. Chinese scholars argue about the presence of “male” (xiong) and “female” (ci) characteristics, differences, and relations in the context of ancient Chinese philosophy. Although affirming this interpretation would provide a space for comparative studies with Western traditions, some thinkers believe that doing so distorts traditional Chinese thought.

Zhang Xianglong is a prominent representative of those who think that Chinese philosophy and culture have long been influenced by concepts of gender. For him, Chinese thinking is fundamentally gendered as it takes the interaction between male and female as the basic model for philosophical investigations. He further argues that it is one of the core aspects of mainstream thought in China. Zhang demonstrates that yin and yang strongly connote ideas of female and male, and identifies such gendered thought in works as early as the Zhouyi, or Yijing (Book of Changes), a traditional Chinese divinatory text of uncertain antiquity consisting of hexagrams and their interpretations, as well as throughout the later traditions of Confucianism, Daoism, and Chinese Buddhism. Accordingly, he argues that yin and women have “in principle never been doomed to be inferior” and “discrimination against women in ancient Chinese culture is neither deterministic nor universal” (Zhang 2002:5). Such a claim is dubious, as the dualistic dynamic of yin and yang, while positing both aspects as essential to existence and in this way ontologically equal, has been generally presented as inherently hierarchical. Chen Jiaqi opposes Zhang’s broader position, arguing that yin and yang are not necessarily related to gender. For Chen, yin and yang primarily involve social relationships, political forms, and weighing advantages and disadvantages. He holds that gender characteristics are too abstract to be practically relevant in this context, and do not apply directly to social forms (Chen 2003).

From a historical perspective, Chen’s interpretation is less convincing than Zhang’s. There are numerous Chinese texts where yin and yang are broadly associated with gender. While yang and yin are not exclusively defined as “male” and “female,” and either sex can be considered yin or yang within a given context, in terms of their most general relation to one another, yin references the female and yang the male. For example, the Daoist text known as the Taipingjing (Scripture of Great Peace) records that “the male and female are the root of yin and yang.” The Han dynasty Confucian thinker Dong Zhongshu (195-115 B.C.E.) also writes, “Yin and yang of the heavens and the earth [which together refer to the cosmos] should be male and female, and the male and female should be yin and yang. Thereby, yin and yang can be called male and female, and male and female can be called yin and yang.” These and other texts draw a strong link between yin as female and yang as male. However, it is important to also recognize that gender itself is not as malleable as yin and yang, despite this connection. While gender remains fixed, their coupling with yin and yang is not. This close and complex relationship means yin and yang themselves require examination if their role in Chinese gender theory is to be properly understood.

The original meaning of yin and yang had little to do with gender differences. Some of the earliest uses of yin and yang are found in the Shangshu (Book of Documents). Here, the word yang is employed six times, and five times it denotes the southern side of mountains, which receives the most sunlight. The term yin appears three times in the text, and refers to the shadier northern side of mountains. These examples are characteristic of how yin and yang function throughout Chinese intellectual history; they do not refer to particular objects, but act as correlative categorizations. In most instances yin and yang are used to indicate a specific relationship within a determined context. The way sunshine falls on a mountain is the context, and the difference between the northern and southern sides, where the latter receives more light and warmth, determines their association, which is understood as yin and yang. The terms are thereby an expression of the function of the sun on a particular place, but they do not speak to the actual substance of the objects (the sun or mountain) themselves. The specific traits of the objects can only be designated yin and yang in their functional correlation to one another. Within this matrix, yin things share commonalities when viewed in relation to yang things.

In this way, the early association of yin and yang with gender can be seen as speaking to the relationship between genders, and not to their essential or substantial natures. Yin and yang traits were thus seen as able to accurately describe broad differences between males and females as they interact with one another. Fixing the link between these categorizations, having men be yang in relation to women, who are yin, only works in a highly abstract or broad sense. For example, the Book of Changes states that the emperor is supposed to have six male ministers at the south palace (a yang position) and six wives or concubines at the north palace (a yin position). Like the southern and northern sides of a mountain, men and women are yang and yin in the way they serve the emperor. Social positions are linked to gender and understood through yin and yang. The Liji (Record of Rituals) states that “the male is outside, and the wife inside the home. The sun starts in the east and the moon starts in the west. This is the distinction of yin and yang, the positions of husband and wife.” However, in specific contexts, it is possible for the association to be reversed. For instance, in Dong Zhongshu’s Chunqiu Fanlu (Spring and Autumn Annals), we also find that “the sovereign is yang, the minister is yin; the father is yang, the son is yin.” Here males, such as ministers or sons, can also be considered yin. The entire pattern can be overturned, as well, such as in the relationship between an empress and her male ministers, where the woman is yang and the men are considered yin. However, such a situation was often considered something that should be approached with caution, as it violated natural patterns. For example, Wang Bi (226-249 C.E.), who did not care much for Dong Zhongshu’s cosmological interpretation, still argued that a woman who was too strong was not to be married.

In terms of actual practice, the more generalized and stable affiliation between yin as female and yang as male often won out, as exemplified by Wang’s idea. It was commonly appropriated as an ideological tool for backing the oppression of women, especially after Dong Zhongshu’s theories took hold. Dong, whose version of Confucianism won imperial backing during the Han dynasty, was also responsible for promoting the official establishment of a formal cosmology based on yin and yang, which became quite influential in the Chinese tradition. While he allows for men to be understood as yin and women as yang in certain contexts, overall he sought to limit the scope of such reversals. For Dong, males are dominant, powerful, and moral, and therefore yang. Women, on the other hand, are precisely the opposite—subservient, weak, selfish, and jealous—and best described as yin. As a result, female virtues became largely oriented toward social roles, especially women’s duties as wives (for example, the female virtues of chastity and compliancy). Against this biased intellectual background, oppressive practices were supported and initiated. For instance, the widespread acceptance of concubinage and female foot binding in Chinese social history expressed the inequality between genders.

However, this social inequality did not accurately reflect its culture’s philosophical thought. Most Chinese thinkers were very attentive to the advantageousness of the complementary nature of male and female characteristics. In fact, in many texts considered Confucian that are predominant for two millennia of Chinese thought, the political system and gender roles are integrated (Yang 2013). This integration is based on understanding yin and yang as fundamentally affixed to gender and thereby permeating all aspects of social life. Sinologists such as Joseph Needham have identified a “feminine symbol” in Chinese culture, rooted in the Daoist concentration on yin. Roger Ames and David Hall similarly argue that yin and yang indicate a “difference in emphasis rather than difference in kind” and should be viewed as a whole, and that therefore their relationship can be likened to that of male and female traits (Ames and Hall 1998: 90-96). Overall, while the complementary understanding of yin and yang did not bring about gender equality in traditional Chinese society, it remains a key factor for comprehending Chinese conceptions of gender. As Robin Wang has noted, “on the one hand, yinyang seems to be an intriguing and valuable conceptual resource in ancient Chinese thought for a balanced account of gender equality; on the other hand, no one can deny the fact that the inhumane treatment of women throughout Chinese history has often been rationalized in the name of yinyang” (Wang 2012: xi).

2. Human Tendencies (Nature) and Gender

Gender issues play an important role in the history of Chinese thought. Many thinkers theorized about the significance of gender in a variety of areas. The precondition for this discussion is an interpretation of xing, “nature” or “tendencies.” The idea of “differences of xing” constitutes the modern term for “gender,” xingbie (literally “tendency differences”) making xing central to this discussion. It should be noted that the Chinese understanding of xing, including “human xing,” is closer to “tendency” or “propensity” than traditional Western conceptions of human “nature.” This is mainly because xing is not seen as something static or unchangeable. (It is for this reason that Ames and Hall, in the quote above, highlight the difference between “emphasis” and “kind.”) The way xing is understood greatly contributes to the way arguments about gender unfold.

The term xing first became an important philosophical concept in discussions about humanity and eventually human tendency, or renxing. In terms of its composition, the character xing is made up of a vertical representation of xin, “heart-mind” (the heart was thought to be the organ responsible for both thoughts and feelings/emotions) on the left side. This complements the character sheng, to the right, which can mean “generation,” “grow,” or “give birth to.” In many cases, the way sheng is understood has a significant impact on interpreting xing and gender. As a noun, sheng can mean “natural life,” which gives rise to theories about “original nature” or “foundational tendencies” (benxing). It thereby connotes vital activities and physiological desires or needs. It is in this sense that Mengzi (372-289 B.C.E.) describes human tendencies (renxing) as desiring to eat and have sex. He also says that form and color are natural characteristics, or natural xing. The Record of Rituals similarly comments that food, drink, and relations between men and women are defining human interests. Xunzi  (312-238 B.C.E.), generally regarded as the last great classical Confucian thinker, fundamentally disagreed with Mengzi’s claim that humans naturally tend toward what is good or moral. He did, however, similarly classify xing as the desire for food, warmth, and rest.

Sheng can also be a verb, which gives xing a slightly different connotation. As a verb, sheng indicates creation and growth, and thus supports the suggestion that xing should be understood as human growth through the development of one’s heart-mind, the root, or seat, of human nature or tendencies. The Mengzi expressly refers to this, stating that xing is understood through the heart-mind. This also marks the distinction between humans and animals. A human xing provides specific characteristics and enables a certain orientation for growth that is unique in that it includes a moral dimension. It is in this sense that Mengzi proposes his theory for natural human goodness, a suggestion that Xunzi later rebuts, albeit upon a similar understanding of xing. Texts classified as Daoist, such as the Laozi and Zhuangzi, similarly affirm that xing is what endows beings with their particular virtuousness (though it is not necessarily moral).

It is on the basis of human nature/tendencies that their unique capacity for moral cultivation is given. The Xing Zi Ming Chu (Recipes for Nourishing Life), a 4th century B.C.E. text recovered from the Guodian archaeological site, comments that human beings are defined by the capacity and desire to learn. Natural human tendencies are thereby not simply inherent, they also need to be grown and refined. The Mengzi argues that learning is nothing more than developing and cultivating aspects of one’s own heart-mind. The Xunzi agrees, adding that too much change or purposeful change can bring about falsity—which often results in immoral thoughts, feelings, or actions. These texts agree in their argument that there are certain natural patterns or processes for each thing, and deviating from these is potentially dangerous. Anything “false” or out of accordance with these patterns is likely to be immoral and harmful to oneself and society, so certain restrictions are placed on human practice to promote moral growth. These discussions look at human tendencies as largely shaped in the context of society, and can be taken as a conceptual basis for understanding gender as a natural tendency that is steered through social institutions. For example, when Mengzi is asked why the ancient sage-ruler Shun lied to his parents in order to marry, Mengzi defends Shun as doing the right thing. Explaining that otherwise Shun would have remained a bachelor, Mengzi writes, “The greatest of human relations is that a man and a woman live together.” Thus Mengzi argues that Shun’s moral character was based on proper cultivation of his natural tendencies according to social mores.

One’s individual nature is largely influenced, and to some extent even generated, by one’s cultural surroundings. This also produces physiological properties that account for a wide variety of characteristics that are then reflected in aspects of gender, culture, and social status. Linked to the understanding of yin and yang as functionally codependent categorizations, differences between genders are characterized on the basis of their distinguishing features, and defined correlatively. This means that behavior and identity largely arise within the context of male-female relations. One’s natural tendencies include gender identity as either xiong xing (male tendencies) or ci xing (female tendencies), which one is supposed to cultivate accordingly. Thus there are more physiological and cultural aspects to human tendencies, as well. In these diverse ways, Chinese philosophy emphasizes the difference between males and females, believing that each has their own particular aspects to offer, which are complementary and can be unified to form a harmonious whole (though this does not necessarily imply their equality).

3. Gender Cosmology

The idea of gender as being fundamentally understood through respective dissimilarities (nan nü you bie) is based in the physiological differences between men and women, but also manifests in philosophic thought. In fact, in one of the earliest references to the distinction between men and women, the Record of Rituals asserts:

Once there is a difference between males and females, then there can be love between fathers and sons. Once there is love between fathers and sons, obligations are generated. Once obligations are generated, rituals are made. Once rituals are made, all things can be at ease.

The original difference between genders is—presumably through the generative power of their combination—the foundation for obligations (or morality) and thus ritual (or social moral patterns), which allows finally for harmony in the cosmos as a whole. Through the establishment of the concept that human tendencies are formed and act in line with nature, Chinese gender cosmology applies an analogous generative model of yin and yang to a general understanding of the world.

Another early text, the 3rd century B.C.E. medical compendium Huangdi Neijing (Inner Scripture of the Yellow Emperor), offers one of the most comprehensive definitions of yin and yang:

Yin and yang are the dao (“way”) of the heavens and earth, they provide the model for the net (gangji) of all beings, they are the parents of all change and transformation, and the origin of life and death, and the residence for spirit and insight. To heal illness [one] must seek its root. (Zhang 2002: 41)

Here, yin and yang are taken as a pattern embedded in the existence of all beings, thus providing the foundation for a coherent worldview. This weaves together human beings, nature, and dao (way) in a manner that creates a dynamic wholeness pervaded by and mediated through the interaction of yin and yang. This Chinese cosmological view sees all things, including humans, as borne of both yin and yang and thus naturally integrated with one another. In essence, dao represents the interaction between yin and yang, and it is in this respect that the Laozi tells us that dao is both the source and the model, or pattern, for all things (Laozi 25). More directly, the Laozi comments that all things in turn carry yin and embrace yang (Laozi 42). This shows that through yin and yang and their patterns of interaction dao provides the rhythm of the cosmos. From this perspective the genders also complement and nourish one another, and are even vital to one another.

The idea that the interaction of yin and yang generates the myriad things in existence corresponds to intercourse between male and female as the only means for reproducing life. Therefore, the nature of men and women in Chinese philosophy is not only based on purely physiological characteristics and differences, but is also the embodiment of yin and yang forces in gender. The dao of men and women are linked to the dao of the universe in terms of reproducing life. This is systematically discussed in the Book of Changes, one of China’s most ancient and influential texts. There, eight trigrams are given, which represent eight natural phenomena and can further be combined to form sixty-four hexagrams. These are expressions of the function and movement of yin and yang. They are composed of two contrasting symbols: the yang-yao unbroken horizontal line, and the yin-yao broken horizontal line. Some scholars see these as referring to the male and female genitals respectively. In this sense, the first two hexagrams qian or “heaven” (which is six yang-yaos) and kun or “earth” (six yin-yaos) can be interpreted as representing pure yin and yang. They are also responsible for the formation of general gender stereotypes in Chinese thought. They provide the gateways for change, and are considered, quite literally, the father and mother of all other hexagrams (which equates to all things in the world). The broad system of the Book of Changes attempts to explain every type of change and existence, and is built upon an identification of yin and yang with the sexes as well as their interaction with one another.

According to the “Xici Zhuan” (Commentary on the Appended Phrases) section of the Book of Changes, qian is equated with the heavens, yang, power, and creativity, while kun is identified with the earth, yin, receptivity, and preservation. Their interaction generates all things and events in a way that is similar to the intercourse between males and females, bringing about new life. The Commentary on the Appended Phrases makes the link to gender issues clear by stating that both qian and kun have their own daos (ways) that are responsible for the male and female respectively. The text goes on to discuss the interaction between the two, both cosmologically in terms of the heavens and earth and biologically in terms of the sexes. The conclusion is that their combination and interrelation is responsible for all living things and their changes. The intercourse between genders is a harmonization of yin and yang that is necessary not only for an individual’s well-being, but also for the proper functioning of the cosmos. Interaction between genders is thus the primary mechanism of life, which explains all forms of generation, transformation, and existence.

4. Gender and Social Order

Theoretically, the social order of gender in Chinese thought is broadly formed on the concepts of the heavens and earth and yin and yang. When these notions are applied to the social field, they are likened to the male and female genders. In the aforementioned Commentary on the Appended Phrases, heaven and yang are considered honorable, while the earth and yin are seen as lowly in comparison. Since the former are coupled with qian, which comprises maleness, and the latter with kun, which marks femaleness, these gender roles are valued similarly. The Inner Scripture of the Yellow Emperor says that yang’s maleness is meant for the outside, and yin’s femaleness for the inside. Men, being equated here with yang, are also associated with superiority, motion, and firmness, while women are coupled with yin and so seen as inferior, still, and gentle. Gender cosmology then largely replaced more dynamic views of gender roles with sharply defined unequal relationships, and these were generally echoed throughout the culture. The social order that emerged from this thought saw men as largely in charge of external affairs and superior to women.

The specific operational mode for maintaining this social order and its gender distinctions is li, propriety or ritual. The Record of Rituals focuses much of its discourse on specific rules regarding distinct practices reserved for certain individuals through gender categorization. In this way, wedding ceremonies are the root of propriety. Marriage is especially important because it is politically valuable for establishing and sustaining social order through designated male-female relations. In the Record of Rituals, men and women are asked to observe strict separation in society and uphold the distinction between the outer and inner. (Men being responsible for the family’s “outer” dealings, including legal, economic, and political affairs, and women the “inner” ones, such as familial relations and housework.) Social roles were thereby moralized according to gender. The Record of Rituals also tells us that the rites as a couple begin with gender responsibilities. It states, for example, that when outside the home the husband is supposed to lead the way and that the wife should follow. However, within the home women were supposed to obey men as well, even boys. Before marriage, a girl was expected to listen to her father, and then after marriage to be obedient to her husband, or to their sons if he died. These general guidelines are commonly referred to in other texts as the sancong side or “three obediences and four virtues,” which dominated theories of proper social ordering for most of China’s history.

The four virtues—women’s virtue (fude), women’s speech (fuyan), women’s appearance (furong), and women’s work (fugong)—were expounded on by Ban Zhao (45-120 C.E.) in her book Nüjie (Admonitions for Women). She believed that women should be conservative, humble, and quiet in expressing ritual or filial propriety as their virtue. In the same way, a women’s speech should not be “flowery” or persuasive, but yielding and circumspect. She should also pay close attention to her appearance, be clean and proper, and act especially carefully around guests and in public. Her work consists mainly in household practicalities, such as weaving and food preparation.

The sancong (three obediences) can also be regarded as a forerunner to the san gang, or “three cardinal guides,” of the later Han dynasty (25-220 C.E.). The three cardinal guides were put forward by the aforementioned Dong Zhongshu and contributed greatly to integrating yin and yang gender cosmology into the framework of Confucian ethics. These guides are regulations about relationships—they are defined as the ruler guiding ministers, fathers guiding sons, and husbands guiding wives. Although these rules lack specific content, they do provide a general understanding for ordering society that is concentrated on proper relationships, which is the basic element for morality in many Confucian texts. Here a strong gender bias emerges. The partiality shown toward the elevated position of husbands is only further bolstered by the other two relationships being completely male-based. The only time females are mentioned they are last. Moreover, the ranking of the relationships themselves are hierarchical, relegating women to the lowest level of this order.

Dong also elaborated on distinguishing goodness from evil based on elevating things associated with yang and its general characteristics as ultimately superior to yin, and at the same time emphasized their connections to gender characteristics. This further reinforces deep gender bias. The language of Dong’s Spring and Autumn Annals praises males and presents a negative view of females and all things feminine. The text explicitly argues that even if there are ways in which the husband is inferior to the wife, the former is still yang and therefore better overall. Even more drastically, it states that evilness and all things bad belong to yin, while goodness and all things good are associated with yang, which clearly implicitly links good and evil to male and female, respectively. There are places where, due to the interrelated correlative relationship between yin and yang, the female might be yang and therefore superior in certain aspects, but since she is mostly yin, she is always worse overall. The text even goes so far as to require that relationships between men and women be adjusted to strictly conform to the three cardinal guides. Rules require that subjects obey their rulers, children their fathers, and wives their husbands. In Dong’s other writings, he goes a step further, declaring that the three cardinal guides are a mandate of the heavens. This gives cosmological support to his social arrangement, equating male superiority with the natural ordering of all things.

In the Baihutong (Philosophical Discussions in the White Tiger Hall), which is a collection of court debates from the later Han dynasty, discourse on Dong’s guidelines is taken further. During this time, Confucianism was established as the official state ideology and heavily influenced many areas of politics, including court functioning, policies, and education. This, in turn, provided the foundation for a Confucian society in which this ideology successfully penetrated the daily lives of the state’s entire populace. Dong’s interpretation of ancient texts, including his reading of gender cosmology, became especially powerful as Confucianism believes that the basis for social order and morality begins in human interaction, not individuals. In this context, people are mainly understood according to their roles in society or relationships with others, which were already established as naturally hierarchical in the Analects (the record of Confucius’s actions and words). Dong’s work added a distinct favoring of male over female that became increasingly established and widespread as Confucianism became increasingly influential. Conceived of as analogous to the relationship between rulers and ministers, teachers and students, or parents and children, the two sexes were generally assumed to be a natural ordering of the superior and inferior.

Although these sexist trends are not found in earlier texts—at least not explicitly—they became quite common after the Han dynasty. (The most controversial exception to this is in Analects 17:25, where Confucius is recorded to have equated petty people and women; however, it is unclear exactly what he meant, and whether or not he was referring to women in general or just “petty” ones.) By the Song dynasty (960-1279 C.E.), mainstream political and intellectual discourse viewed both the ability and moral character of women as significantly inferior to males. The Confucian classic known as the Shijing (Book of Poetry) includes the controversial line “Male intellect builds states, female intellect topples states” (Zhou 2002: 489), which in the Song dynasty became understood as an argument for keeping women out of politics and state affairs. On this basis, the Neo-Confucian thinker Zhu Xi  (1130-1200) criticized Wu Zetian, China’s only female emperor, arguing that failure to observe Dong’s three cardinal guides was ultimately responsible for the chaos, violence, and civil wars that had followed the Tang dynasty (618-907 C.E.). Later, during the Ming dynasty (1368-1644 C.E.), the Confucian thinker Zhang Dai (1597-1679 C.E.) developed the idea that males express virtuousness through their ability to debate and contend with one another, while women find virtuousness in lacking this skill. Although he did not expound much on this idea, it was taken to mean that women were both unable and ought not contend with others, including their husband. Their obedience was a display of morality. Similarly, men were expected to dominate their wives in a somewhat disrespectful manner in order to display their own ethical cultivation. In more extreme interpretations, Zhang’s notion was read as “a woman without talent is virtuous.” This was linked to the cosmological understanding of gender roles so that failure to follow these guides meant the betrayal of natural patterns—the traditional foundation for ethical norms. During this time, imperial law stated that any man over forty without a male heir must take on a concubine to aid him in producing one.

The domination of these views in both culture and philosophy caused the Chinese tradition to attach great importance to hierarchical gender roles. Social order based itself on cosmological theories that were automatically normative and constituted guidelines for moral cultivation. Despite the Book of Changes and Laozi’s emphasis on the importance of the interaction between yin and yang as complementary and mutually constitutive, women were generally regarded as inferior.

5. Family Patterns

Ideal political and social order in the state was regarded as a replication of the family model on a larger scale. The way neighbors interacted, friends treated one another, and ministers served rulers were all based on models of familial relationships. Early Confucian texts provided the ideological foundation for this pattern by arguing that morality must be cultivated at home first before it could be adequately practiced in society. In terms of gender, the hierarchical relationships in socio-political spheres were simply extensions of the superiority of husbands in spousal relations. The Record of Rituals explains, “Just as two rulers cannot coexist in one country, a household cannot have two masters; only one can govern” (Zheng 2008: 2353). Dong Zhongshu’s three cardinal guides promoted this attitude by requiring that wives listen to their husbands in the same way that children should listen to fathers and then further placing the spousal relationship below that of father and son. Zhu Xi bolstered this order by arguing that children should respect both parents, but that the father should be absolutely superior to the mother. Zhu recognized that there were aspects of life, mostly household affairs (nei), that women were well suited for, but saw men’s duties as superior, and therefore advocated that males always dominate females.

In line with the mutual relationship of yin and yang emphasized by the Book of Changes and Daoism, marriages were largely understood as being a deferential equivalence. The wedding rites in the Record of Rituals say that marriages are important for maintaining ancestral sacrifice and family lineages. The text describes that when a groom gives a salute, the bride can sit, and that during the ceremony they should eat at the same table and drink from the same bottle to display their mutual affection, trust, and support. This also aligns the woman, who had no official rank of her own, with her husband’s rank. The Record of Rituals further records that during China’s first dynasties, enlightened monarchs respected their wives and children, and that this is in line with natural order or dao. The Xiaojing (Classic of Filial Piety) also says that rulers should never insult even their concubines, let alone their wives. Although only leaders are mentioned, according to Chinese ethical systems people are supposed to emanate their superiors, so this deference would ideally be practiced in every household. However, such roles were largely based on function. For men this meant learning, working, and carrying on the ancestral line. Women were in charge of household affairs and principally responsible for producing a male heir. If they failed in the latter, their martial function was largely unfulfilled, which reflected poorly on the husband, as well. Since the women’s function was largely mechanistic, her status was much lower and she was essentially anonymous, without independent social standing. Men could take on concubines to produce heirs or simply for pleasure, and while wives were “in charge” of concubines, they could also be (albeit rarely) replaced by them, and would have to serve the sons of concubines if they produced none of their own. Legally, men owned their wives, and there was often little practical recourse for a woman against her husband, even though the laws of certain periods allowed for it.

The Book of Poetry contains a large number of poems and songs describing marriage and love between men and women, some of which express the joys and sorrows of women. The collection includes lamentations of men going off on business or to war, and women’s complaints of being abandoned by their husbands after concubines are purchased. They are meant to remind husbands of social expectations and moral responsibilities. The Lienüzhuan (Biographies of Virtuous Women) and Xunzi both argue that the husband-wife relation is foundational for the family, and therefore for a stable society, as well. (The Zhongyong, or Doctrine of the Mean, adds that the sage’s virtue is found most simply in husband-wife relations.) Liu Xiang (77 B.C.E.-6 C.E.), the complier of the Lienüzhuan, firmly believed that morality starts in the family and reverberates out into society. He grouped virtuous women into six categories, or virtues: maternal rectitude (muyi), sage-like intelligence (xianming), humane wisdom (renzhi), purity and deference (zhenshun), chastity and dutifulness (jieyi), and skill in arguments and communication (biantong). Later editions of this text became less gender specific, but Liu emphasized women who were able to carry out certain female-related duties in role-specific conditions (including those of daughter, wife, daughter-in-law, and mother). Although Liu did not mention it, later texts argued that widows should not remarry or take on lovers. The Neo-Confucian thinker Cheng Yi  (1033-1107) was one of the harshest interpreters of widow fidelity, claiming that they should rather starve to death than take on a second husband. Zhu Xi, who disagreed with Cheng on many issues, argued that this was not practical; yet it was generally regarded as virtuous, even if not widely practiced. Cheng’s proposal was also important because he did not restrict such devotion to women, which created a rare sense of equality (of which Zhu also disapproved).

Analogous to yin and yang, the relationship of the wife and “inner” with the husband and “outer” is conceived of as complementary, not dualistic. According to the functional distinction of “inner” and “outer,” women were responsible for everything in the house, while men dominated external affairs. The most basic form of this division was given as “Men plow and women weave” (nan geng nü zhi). However, this distinction is not equivalent to the Western concepts of private and public. In fact, during the Wei-Jin period of national disunity (265-420 C.E.), it was common for women in northern Chinese states to handle family legal matters at court, go out to present gifts, and handle certain business matters. The woman’s role was not always marginalized, but it was focused on specific tasks. Chinese families often believed that educating their daughters well (though not necessarily in literary learning) was the precondition for improving the family and encouraging orderliness. Women were also often the primary caretakers and to some extent educators of all children, male or female—an invaluable role for the entire household. A couple’s shared goals, like obtaining wealth or educating children, were designated into separate spheres that either the wife or husband would control. The third-century B.C.E. philosophical miscellany known as Lüshi Chunqiu (Mr. Lü’s Spring and Autumn Annals) declares that husbands should have clothes to wear without weaving and wives have food to eat without farming because of their division of labor, which allows for a more efficacious family and society. Individual differences should be acknowledged so that the couple can support and assist one another.

6. Chinese Cultural Resources for Feminism

Taking yin and yang as an analogy for female and male, classical Chinese thought presents a complex picture of their interaction. Firstly, with thinkers such as Dong Zhongshu, the split between the two genders can be seen as relatively fixed. On this basis regulations on gender roles are equally stabilized, so that they are considered complementary, but not equal. The second major trend, seen most explicitly in the Laozi, values the inseparability of yin and yang, which is equated with the female and male. This interpretation explores the productive and efficacious nature of yin, or feminine powers. While not necessarily feminist, this latter view provides a robust resource for exploring feminism in Chinese thought. These two orientations were developed along the lines of their respective representatives in Chinese traditions.

Like the relationship between yin and yang, a complementary relationship can be seen between these two views on gender. Thinkers such as Confucius, Mengzi, Xunzi, Dong Zhongshu, and Zhu Xi are often taken to represent Confucianism, which belongs to the first viewpoint. The Laozi and Zhuangzi have then been seen as opposed to these thinkers, and are representative of Daoism. However, the actual relationship between these two “schools” is much more integrated. For example, Wang Bi wrote what is generally regarded as the standard commentary on the Laozi, and yet he considered Confucius to be a higher sage than Laozi. Similarly, actual Chinese social practices cannot be traced back to either Daoism or Confucianism exclusively, though one or the other may be more emphasized in particular cases. Taken as separate, they each highlight different aspects that, when integrated with one another, represent a whole. Although they are sometimes read as opposing views, both are equally indispensable for comprehending Chinese culture and history.

Despite the possibility of reading feminism into many Chinese texts, there can be no doubt that the Chinese tradition, as practiced, was largely sexist. For the most part, the inferior position of women was based on readings (whether or not they were misinterpretations) of texts generally classified as Confucian, such as the Record of Rituals, Book of Poetry, or Analects. On the other hand, other texts regarded as Confucian—such as the Book of Changes or Classic of Filial Piety—harbor rich resources for feminism in China. So while sexist practices are and were frequently defended on the basis of Confucian texts, this is limited to particular passages, and does not speak to the complexity of either Confucianism or Chinese traditions in general.

As a response to dominant practices, the Laozi—regardless of whether it was formed earlier or later than other major texts, such as the Analects—favors notions that counter (but do not necessarily oppose) early social values. While the Record of Rituals and Book of Poetry contain or promote hierarchical interpretations of gender issues, the Laozi clearly promotes nominally feminine characteristics and values. (This puts the Laozi in conflict with some branches of feminism that seek to destroy notions of “female” or gender-oriented traits and tendencies.) While this does not necessarily equate the Laozi with what is now called “feminism,” it does provide Chinese culture with a potential resource for reviving or creating conceptions of  femininity in a more positive light.

The major philosophical concept in the Laozi is dao (way). The first chapter of the text claims that the unchanging dao cannot be spoken of, but it does offer clues in the form of a variety of images that appear throughout its eighty-one chapters. Several of the descriptions associate dao with the feminine, maternal, or female “gate.” In this context, dao is given three important connotations. It is responsible for the origin of all things, it is all things, and it provides the patterns that they should follow. The comparison to a woman’s body and its function of generation (sheng) identify dao as feminine, and therefore speak to the power of the female. The Laozi can therefore be read as advocating that female powers and positions are superior to their male counterparts. In modern scholarship, this is frequently noted, and several scholars have attempted to use the Laozi to support Chinese and comparative feminist studies. Images in the text strongly support these investigations.

For example, the text speaks of the gushen, the “spirit of the valley,” which is said to “never die” and is called xuanpin, or “mysterious femininity” (ch. 6). The character for “spirit,” gu, originally meant “generation.” It is identified with sheng (part of the character for gender and tendencies), and its shape is sometimes taken to represent the female genitals. In other places, dao is referred to as the mother and said to have given birth to all things (ch. 52). Contemporary scholars also point out that there are no “male” images or traditionally male traits linked to dao in the Laozi. Dao’s characteristics, such as being “low,” “soft,” and “weak,” are all associated with yin and femininity, thereby forging a strong link between dao and the female.

Yin tendencies are not, however, exclusively valued. The Laozi offers a more balanced view, which is why it can be used as a resource of feminism, but is not necessarily feminist itself. For example, it says that all things come from dao and that they carry the yin and embrace the yang, and that their blending is what produces harmony in the world (ch. 42). Yin is arguably more basic, but is prized for its ability to overcome yang, just as the soft can overcome the hard and stillness can defeat movement. These notions are applied to many aspects of life, including sexual, political, and military examples. These examples revere female traits, arguing that yin should be acknowledged for its numerous strengths, but do not reject the importance of yang.

Taken as a political text, the Laozi argues that the ruler should take on more female than male traits in order to properly govern the world. This is supposed to allow him to remain “still” while others are in motion, ideally self-ordering. Although this confirms the usefulness of female virtue, it is not an argument for it being superior, or even equal to male counterparts. Rather, it demonstrates how female characteristics can be used to promote efficacy.

Given that sexist practices have largely be defended by reference to texts and scholars that self-identify with the Confucian tradition, it is easy to see why contemporary scholars have looked to the Laozi as one of the major sources for constructing Chinese feminism. It is certainly the first major Chinese philosophical text that explicitly promotes a variety of female traits and values, which allows room for feminist consciousness and discourse.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger T., and David L. Hall. Thinking from the Han: Self, Truth, and Transcendence in Chinese and Western Culture. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1998.
    • (This book includes a chapter on gender roles that outlines how the Confucian tradition can be used to establish a foundation for Chinese gender equality.)
  • Ames, Roger T., and Henry Rosemont Jr., trans. The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation. New York, NY: Ballantine Books, 1998.
    • (An excellent translation of the Confucian Analects.)
  • Bossler, Beverly. Courtesans, Concubines and the Cult of Female Fidelity: Gender and Social Change in China, 1000–1400. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2012.
    • (A superb study of how female roles and virtues shaped Chinese family life, politics,and academics.)
  • Chen, Jiaqi. “Critique of Zhang Xianglong.” Zhejiang Academic Journal 4 (2003): 127–130.
    • (This article points out inequalities of gender rules in Chinese philosophy and social systems.)
  • Moeller, Hans-Georg, trans. Daodejing: A Complete Translation and Commentary. Chicago, IL: Open Court, 2007.
    • (Moeller’s commentary is sensitive to feminist interpretations of the Daodejing or Laozi.)
  • Rosenlee, Li-Hsiang. Confucianism and Women. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2006.
    • (A book-length study of gender roles in the Confucian tradition.)
  • Van Norden, Bryan, trans. Mengzi, with Selections from Traditional Commentaries. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2008.
    • (A masterful translation of the Mengzi with commentaries from traditional Chinese scholars.)
  • Wang, Robin R. Yinyang: The Way of Heaven and Earth in Chinese Thought and Culture. NY: Cambridge University Press, 2012.
    • (The best study of Chinese yinyang theory in English. The text also includes discussions of gender issues.)
  • Wang, Robin R. Images of Women in Chinese Thought and Culture: Writings from the Pre-Qin Period through the Song Dynasty. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2003.
    • (An excellent resource for gender issues in Chinese thought.)


Author Information

Lijuan Shen
Xi’an University of Architecture and Technology


Paul D’Ambrosio
East China Normal University


Feminist-Pragmatism is a philosophical tradition, which draws upon the insights of both feminist and pragmatist theory and practice. It is fundamentally concerned with enlarging philosophical thought through activism and lived experience, and assumes feminist and pragmatist ideas to be mutually beneficial for liberatory causes. Feminist-pragmatism emphasises the need to redress false distinctions, or dualisms, as these usually result in a denigration of one oppositional by another. Thus, feminist-pragmatists critique such bifurcations as thought/action, mind/body, universal/particular, and they show how the skewed favouring of one over the other results in philosophical theories which are incapable of explaining our gendered existences, positions in society, understandings of knowledge, or learning experiences. Feminist-pragmatists contribute to current debates in epistemology, social and political philosophy, philosophy of education, ethics, and metaphysics. Their work reflects the theoretical advances made by feminist theorists especially over the course of the latter part of the twentieth century, while being rooted in the principles and criticisms of the classical pragmatists.

Importantly, contemporary feminist-pragmatists have highlighted the fact that women, indeed feminist women, played a central role in the development of classical pragmatism itself, either by influencing the work of male pragmatist philosophers, or by constituting formidable thinkers in their own right. This means, then, that feminist-pragmatism can be traced to the origins of pragmatism itself, which developed primarily in North America from about the mid-nineteenth century to the mid-twentieth century, coinciding with the Progressive Era of 1890–1920.

This article will begin by presenting early feminist-pragmatism in section one, and will then move on to discuss contemporary feminist-pragmatism in section two. Throughout, the philosophical tradition under discussion will be referred to as feminist-pragmatism, although some theorists refer to it as pragmatist-feminism, or indeed, use both terms interchangeably. Present terminology does not imply a favouring of feminism over pragmatism, but simply indicates a tradition of joint feminist and pragmatist philosophising.

Table of Contents

  1. Early Feminist-Pragmatism
    1. Classical Pragmatism and the Recovery of Feminist- Pragmatist Work
    2. Jane Addams
    3. Early Feminist-Pragmatist Legacy
  2. Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatism
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Early Pragmatist and Feminist-Pragmatist Sources
    2. Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatist Sources:
      1. Introductions or Overviews
      2. More Advanced or Specialised Sources

1. Early Feminist-Pragmatism

a. Classical Pragmatism and the Recovery of Feminist- Pragmatist Work

In the 21st century pragmatism has experienced something of a renaissance, with contemporary philosophers returning to the works of the classical pragmatists, by re-appropriating their insights and methods for current philosophical problems. Among such neo-pragmatists is a growing number of feminist thinkers and activists who seek to particularly utilise pragmatism’s theories and concepts to ameliorate problems originating in oppressive systems structured by gender, race, class, and other markers of difference. As this article will demonstrate, there are several aspects of pragmatist philosophy which appear to overlap with the priorities of feminists, making pragmatism an attractive and valuable resource for a joint feminist-pragmatist approach.

While feminists have therefore found a useful ‘ally’ (Siegfried 1993a, 2) in pragmatism as a means of thinking about selves and the worlds they inhabit, this feminist reengagement with pragmatism has also uncovered hitherto unknown or neglected historical thinkers from the classical period. More often than not, historiographies of pragmatism identify the classical pragmatists as Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, John Dewey, and sometimes to a lesser extent George Herbert Mead, George Santayana, or Josiah Royce (for more on these topics, see Pragmatism). However, feminists have shown that historical accounts, which are limited to only these figures, omit the contributions made by women to the development of pragmatism, and fail to recognise the important role women pragmatists play as classical pragmatists.

For instance, Alice Chipman Dewey, John Dewey’s wife, had a significant impact upon the latter’s thought, indeed, she ran the experimental Lab School at the University of Chicago, where Dewey’s educational theories were given real-life application (see John Dewey). Moreover, Alice’s feminism and religious unorthodoxy formed an important influence in the trajectory Dewey’s idealism and theism took, and it is now generally acknowledged that Dewey’s concern with the social problems of his day can be attributed to Alice (West, 78–79). Dewey and Alice met at the University of Michigan, where women had only recently been allowed to undertake studies, and where Dewey was employed as a young philosophy instructor. They married in 1886, and throughout her lifetime, Alice continued to affect Dewey’s beliefs, being particularly concerned with women’s rights, while going on to expand her knowledge and practice in the field of education – a field she had entered as a teacher before beginning college. Describing her mother as a woman with a “brilliant mind...a sensitive nature combined with indomitable courage and energy,” Jane Dewey held Alice largely responsible for Dewey’s “early widening of...philosophic interests from the commentative and classical to the field of contemporary life” (Dewey 1987, 21). Given that Dewey understood philosophy as a means to redressing the problems of his time, and given that Alice awakened a sort of social consciousness in Dewey, it is obvious what a pivotal role she played in Dewey’s thought, and, in turn, in the development of pragmatism more generally.

While several women influenced pragmatism in such a manner, there are examples of women thinkers from this early period who could legitimately be classed alongside the traditionally acknowledged pragmatists. Thus, recent efforts to recover women pragmatist work have resulted in the identification of Jane Addams as a philosopher and social reformer, whose name should be listed in conjunction with Peirce, James and Dewey in the historical annals of pragmatism. Like Alice Chipman Dewey, Addams had a profound effect on Dewey, however, she was also a prolific writer and activist, who sought to bring about the real-life changes she theorised. Many other pragmatists at the time were connected to Addams, particularly through her activist headquarters and home, Hull House. Addams set up Hull House as a hub for local activities and community organising, as she shared her life with the diverse immigrant groups of one of Chicago’s poorest areas. Hull House soon became a centre for people wishing to contribute to Addams’s vision, and several women emerged from this environment having already effected substantial changes in such diverse areas as education, industrial relations, and architecture, and subsequently going on to establish successful careers, often as the first leading women in their respective chosen fields.

Charlotte Perkins Gilman, for example, stayed in Hull House for a month, and was a prominent social reformer, drawing particular attention to women’s domestic role and the politics of urban planning. Gilman argued that the division of labour disadvantaged and trapped women in the domestic sphere, and she maintained that household work should be professionalised. As such, Gilman has been understood as occupying a place in the history of material feminism, however, she has also been shown to rightfully “belon[g] in pragmatism’s pantheon” (Upin, 56). Beyond Gilman’s obvious relationship with Jane Addams and Hull House, Jane Upin also outlines her possibly personal, but certainly intellectual, connection to John Dewey. In fact, Gilman is said to expand upon the latter’s pragmatist insights by extending the basic principle of ‘environmentalism’ (that is, the notion that human nature can be altered by one’s environment), by theorising women’s confinement in the domestic realm, and the effect this has on women as human beings (Upin, 48–54). Sharing Dewey’s and Addams’s regard for Darwinism, and their opposition to a deterministic reading thereof, Gilman joins her pragmatist contemporaries by coupling Darwinism with a belief in the capacity for human beings to bring about change. Like Addams, she takes such change to be especially pertinent for women, and she is therefore a prime example of an early feminist-pragmatist.

While Hull House formed a focal point for pragmatist activism and intellectualism, the universities at which pragmatists taught fulfilled a similar role. For example, Ella Flagg Young studied with John Dewey at the University of Chicago and earned her doctoral degree on “Isolation in the School” before taking up the post of supervisor of the Lab School. Young was a mature student, having already had a successful career as an educator, and Dewey drew upon her vast experience in developing and applying pragmatist concepts and ideas of education. Both Dewey and Young influenced each other, though, and Dewey actually maintained that Young often underestimated her own pragmatist work, which he described as a “concrete empirical pragmatism with reference to philosophical conceptions before the doctrine was ever formulated in print” (quoted in Seigfried 1996, 81). Following Dewey’s departure from the University of Chicago, Young went on to become the first woman superintendent of Chicago’s public schools, and was also the first woman president of the National Educational Association.

Upon leaving Chicago, Dewey taught Elsie Ripley Clapp at Columbia University, who acted simultaneously as his graduate assistant. This was a long and fruitful collaboration, with Clapp not only helping Dewey to structure and develop courses, but also contributing to research, particularly on education. Dewey appears to have gained insights from her, which he acknowledges in private correspondence, or rather obtusely in his published work. For example, Charlene Haddock Siegfried points out that Dewey states his indebtedness to her (and to other women influences) not in the main text of his works, but rather in the preface (or in footnotes, as the case may be), leaving Clapp’s precise input obscure, and obfuscating the exact nature and scale thereof. And yet, her role is a significant one, as Dewey describes in a letter his indebtedness in profuse terms, noting that “such a generous exploitation of your ideas as is likely to result if and when I publish the outcome, seems to go beyond the limit” (Seigfried 1996, 50). Indeed, Dewey supported Clapp as his successor when he retired, although his enthusiasm was not met by the administration of Teachers College, as she was bypassed for the post. Clapp subsequently ran two experimental rural schools in Jefferson County, Kentucky, and in Arthurdale, West Virginia, the latter being a project conceived by Eleanor Roosevelt. She wrote books on education, incorporating pragmatist ideas developed during her time with Dewey, and acted as editor for Progressive Education. Sadly, her work, and influence on Dewey’s work, became neglected, with accounts of the latter’s academic life omitting Clapp altogether, hence the importance of recovering such historically overlooked figures (Seigfried 1996, 47–52).

Lucy Sprague Mitchell, another student of the pragmatists, was influenced not only by Dewey (with whom she developed a life-long intellectual relationship through her parents, and whose classes she went to at Teachers College in 1913), but she also benefited from being exposed to the Harvard pragmatists, including William James, Josiah Royce, George Herbert Palmer, Hugo Münsterberg, and George Santayana. She became the first dean for women at the University of California at Berkeley, while also taking on a faculty position in English. Mitchell sometimes looked after a friend’s child, Polly, whom she studied intensely, and her enthusiasm for seeing Polly develop, issued in a career change toward childhood education. Polly died when she was only four years old, yet undoubtedly she had a profound effect on Mitchell, who took her cue for pragmatist educational theory from the real-life experiences gained with Polly. Thus, although Mitchell had attended several philosophy classes, she had no interest in becoming a philosopher, finding the (male) philosophers she knew eccentric or aloof. In Alice Freeman Palmer, wife of Herbert Palmer, though, she found a role model, and since Alice had been president of Wellesley in an age where women’s education was still a controversial topic, Mitchell followed in her footsteps, as it were, by opting for an administrative career at Berkeley. The pervasive sexism she encountered there, and her growing belief in “public education [as] the most constructive attack on social problems” (Seigfried 1996, 55), when coupled with her emphasis on experience, resulted in the focus on education in the latter part of her life. Notably, Mitchell’s pragmatist educational theory and practice took hold in the Bank Street School (Seigfried  1996,  52 – 57).

A student of George Herbert Mead, Jessie Taft, is another forgotten pragmatist figure recently ‘unearthed’ by contemporary scholars engaged in recovering women pragmatist work. Taft completed, in 1913, her doctoral thesis, which formed possibly “the first Ph.D. dissertation in philosophy on the women’s movement” (Seigfried 1993b, 215). Entitled “The Woman Movement from the Point of View of Social Consciousness,” it is remarkably contemporary in tone, and appears to anticipate several important issues and conceptual ideas debated by feminist theorists today. Taft argues that women are hampered in both the domestic and public spheres, having control over neither, ultimately resulting in a disconnected and under-developed self with limited social awareness. Drawing parallels with the labour movement, she thus explains the task of the women’s movement as a twofold venture, consisting first of the need to “make women conscious of their relations to a social order, second, to show society its need of conscious womanhood” (Taft 225). She notes that the situation of women is not only inhibitive for women’s selfhood, but also for men’s, and for the “growth,” as Dewey would term it, of society more generally. Writes Taft:

This stage of social development [wherein we shall have conditions favourable for the control of social problems] can never be reached as long as any large class of people, such as its women, are permitted, encouraged, or forced to exist in an unreal world wilfully maintained for that purpose. Nor will the selves of men, in so far as they are formed by their relations to women, ever reach the full possibilities of selfhood while women remain only partially self-conscious. (Taft 229)

Taft extends Mead’s theory of selfhood, and couples it with a tripartite categorisation of consciousness, rejecting individualism in favour of a social reading of selfhood in the context of feminists’ attempts to institute suffrage. Sadly, Taft’s own life story appears to be a stark reminder of the rather slow progress made by the movement she theorised, as it took over two decades for her to find a full-time post after completing her doctorate (Seigfried 1993b, 215 – 218).

Discriminatory and sexist treatment like this undoubtedly impacted upon the lives and work of many of the early women pragmatists. Universities were often loath to recognise women on a par with men, either as students or as faculty members. Several women students of pragmatists, though, found in their teachers male philosophers supportive of women’s education, who repeated their courses at attached women’s colleges (Radcliffe in the case of Harvard), or who committed themselves to coeducation. Unfortunately, such progressiveness was not always matched by the university hierarchy, and women scholars struggled to gain the legitimate and deserved recognition for their work. For instance, Mary Whiton Calkins completed with distinction her Ph.D. in 1895 under the supervision of Hugo Münsterberg. However, she never received her doctorate from Harvard, despite undertaking studies there. She was asked, instead, to take the degree from Radcliffe, but as Seigfried explains, since Radcliffe only provided undergraduate courses, acceptance of such an intermediary would have legitimised Harvard’s continued discriminatory treatment of women. Calkins went on to become a professor at Wellesley, and was the first woman president of both the American Psychological Association and the American Philosophical Association (Seigfried 1993c,  230 – 231).

Given the off-putting nature of such overt sexism, it is not surprising to find that several women pragmatists either left universities, or had only a limited direct involvement with them. Seigfried, for instance, cites Lucy Sprague Mitchell’s letter, in which she details her reaction to encountering misogyny at Berkeley. Mitchell states that she was shocked upon realising “that most of the faculty thought of women frankly as inferior beings” (Seigfried 1996, 54). While many women scholars tried to remain within the university system, one can understand how such a pervasive sexism may pose a deterrent to a continued career in academia. On the other hand, several women pragmatists felt confined not only by the hostility of university administrations and faculty members, but by the largely theoretical nature of academic work. Since pragmatism emphasises experience as a counter-weight to theory, and insists upon the mutually reinforcing and informing nature of experience and theory, many women pragmatists found the university setting constricting.

Thus, Mitchell notes of Jane Addams, that she became for her “a symbol of the ‘real’ world – a world of work and of people that I longed to reach but could not” (Seigfried 1996, 56). The “real world” referred to by Mitchell, although promoted through initiatives such as the Lab School, remained, to too large an extent, inaccessible for pragmatists such as Mitchell, and they therefore sought actual experience outside of the realm of academia. It is for this reason, also, that the most prominent woman pragmatist, Jane Addams, kept her focus on the “real world” outside of universities, despite giving lectures at the University of Chicago. The next section explores the life and thought of this influential pragmatist in greater detail, as her work and impact merits further elucidation, if women’s role in the development of pragmatism is to be fully understood. It is important though, to note in sum, that pragmatism is not confined to universities, but is very much a philosophy inspired by and concerned with “the real world,” whether this is found in academia or outside of it.

b. Jane Addams

Jane AddamsJane Addams epitomises this quest, typical of many women pragmatists, for a life in the “real world” wherein pragmatist insights can be gained and fed into theory production. Thus, Addams’s writings are replete with quotidian experiences and scenes taken from Hull House.  Many of her essays and books concentrate on the personal lives of immigrant neighbours she came to know through her settlement activities, and her diverse intellectual influences lead to a polyvocality rarely seen in more traditional philosophical writing. The voices of her neighbours, novelists, poets, Greek dramatists, and philosophers, mingle in her texts, problematising lived experiences and drawing important theoretical insights therefrom.

The topics she discusses are far from typical Victorian era academic fare. Prostitution, juvenile delinquency, world peace, folk tales, and democracy are just some of the themes covered in her extensive philosophical output. Perhaps because Addams’s writing is unconventional in content and style, has she been dismissed as a mere practitioner. She is often erroneously viewed as an implementer of the male pragmatists’ ideas, and her philosophical insights are denigrated while she is labelled a social worker rather than a philosopher. Although Addams was simultaneously a social worker, sociologist, political activist, labour mediator, and educator, importantly, she was also a formidable pragmatist thinker. Her multiple roles informed a unique body of work so intimately linked to experience that it is perhaps most quintessentially pragmatist, in that there really is no separation between theory and practice in her work.

The recovery work undertaken by contemporary scholars acknowledges this, and has sought to re-establish Addams as a classical pragmatist who captures the progressive era’s spirit in her very being, by living the principles pragmatism espouses. For although Addams was somewhat of a celebrity in her time, just like many other women pragmatists, she was left out of the philosophical canon, being remembered, instead, as a pacifist or suffragist. Renewed interest in Addams, though, has led to a re-examination of her work, and her impact upon the development of pragmatism is now increasingly recognised. For instance, Dewey and Addams had an intimate intellectual relationship, with Dewey becoming a trustee of Hull House, and visiting there frequently to deliver lectures to the Plato Club, Hull House’s philosophical society. Dewey acknowledged his philosophical indebtedness to Addams, and both thinkers influenced each other mutually, developing pragmatist ideas and theories in tandem. Addams’s close links with the University of Chicago meant that a cross-pollination of ideas between faculty members and Hull House residents was inevitable. Further, owing to the fame she achieved in her lifetime, she was in close correspondence with many influential thinkers, writers, activists, and policy makers beyond the realms of academia and the Chicago settlement.

Addams was a sought-after public speaker, and although she had a steadfast belief in the principles she developed in her work, she never spoke on behalf of those whose interests she defended, but chose to speak with them by engaging in an inclusionary approach to transformation. This, perhaps, most aptly characterises Addams’s conception of the settlement, as she rejected the negative stereotyping of people found in supposedly benevolent charity work, and instead opted for understanding and supporting her neighbours through what we would today call a ‘bottom-up’ approach to activism. Hence, Addams understands the settlement as:

an experimental effort to aid in the solution of the social and industrial problems which are engendered by the modern conditions of life in a great city...It is an attempt to relieve, at the same time, the overaccumulation at one end of society and the destitution at the other; but it assumes that this overaccumulation and destitution is most sorely felt in the things that pertain to social and educational advantages. (Addams 2008, 83)

While Hull House counteracted such ‘overaccumulation at one end of society’ through various initiatives – establishing educational courses, art classes, child care and sports facilities, or rallying against corruption in politics and providing space for labour organising – Addams remained non-committed in ideological terms.

She rejected divisiveness and although she supported several causes, she avoided adopting specific labels. In her autobiographical book Twenty Years at Hull House, she wrote of the settlement, that “from its very nature it can stand for no political or social propaganda. It must, in a sense, give the warm welcome of an inn to all such propaganda, if perchance one of them be found an angel” (Addams 2008, 83). This non-ideological attitude was often criticised by commentators, as was, ironically, the one ideology she did assume, that is, pacifism. Addams was an outspoken opponent of war, and campaigned against the U.S.’s entry into World War I. For this, she was vilified and her work was frequently maligned. In later years, though, her activism for peace, which included the co-founding of the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom (WILPF), was recognised, and she was awarded the 1931 Nobel Peace Prize.

Throughout Addams’s varied career, during which she gradually moved from settlement work to more global activism, she developed a pragmatism, which was intimately concerned with instituting progress, particularly for the politically, socially and economically marginalised. Since women made up a large part of this constituency, her work represents a formidable example of early feminist-pragmatism. Addams explicitly addressed the concerns of women, which were largely neglected by the male pragmatists, and her texts provide invaluable insights informed by the gendered nature of our experiences. Her attribution of moral import to pluralism in democracy (Addams 2002a), her cosmopolitanism (Addams 2002b), her meliorism (Addams 2005), her quest for knowledge through ‘perplexities’ (Addams 2002a), her understanding of memory in terms of its transformative potential of past and future (Addams 2002c), and her interpretation of art and beauty as relief from the dreariness of industrial life (Addams 2008), form just some of the significant theoretical contributions to a pragmatist philosophy, which was both lived and intellectually conceived. As such, Addams constitutes a towering figure in the history of feminist-pragmatism and of classical pragmatism more generally.

c. Early Feminist-Pragmatist Legacy

Owing largely to Charlene Haddock Seigfried’s seminal work Pragmatism and Feminism, contemporary feminist-pragmatists have managed to unearth hitherto unknown early pragmatist work undertaken by women. Some of these women were not necessarily feminists, nor were they necessarily primarily concerned with theorising the experiences of women. However, their influences have shaped the development of pragmatism itself, and the work of expressly feminist-pragmatists constitutes a particularly rich resource for contemporary feminist-pragmatist theorists. Thus, the writings of early women pragmatists are being utilised by theorists today, and increased interest in their work has resulted not only in several updated biographies and a reissuing of their texts, but also in new, original books and articles engaging with their arguments and theories (see for example, Hamington, 2010 and Fischer 2009).

Importantly, some of the themes contemporary thinkers are concerned with, are also topics previously explored by their feminist-pragmatist forerunners. For instance, Judy D. Whipps (2006) draws upon the work of Emily Greene Balch to trace the thematic continuity between Balch’s priorities and the priorities of contemporary feminist peace activists. Balch was a pragmatist thinker, economist, and social scientist. Like Addams, she was a co-founder of the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom (WILPF), and was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize fifteen years after Addams had received that same honour. Balch’s activism similarly grew out of her engagement with the settlement movement, although being involved with the foundation of Denison House in 1982, she re-entered academia after two years to continue her studies both in the United States and in Europe. Together with Addams and Alice Hamilton she wrote Women at The Hague (Addams et al.2003), an account of the 1915 International Congress of Women.

Although employed by Wellesley as a professor, her peace activism hampered her academic career, and she subsequently focused solely on advocating for peace. She championed anti-colonialism, being largely responsible for a critical report on United States de facto control over Haiti (1927), criticised unjust trade relations between more or less powerful states, and sought U.N. control of all military bases. Her theoretical work enshrined a cosmopolitanism and pluralism reminiscent of Addams’s ‘bottom-up’ conceptualisation of meliorism. She held that shared work could facilitate shared understanding, arguing that “cooperation in practical, technical tasks is one of the best ways of learning the indispensable art of getting along with one another” (Whipps 126). Importantly, Balch is a predecessor to contemporary women peace activists, who can learn from her pragmatist understandings of international affairs in terms of cooperation and the desire to realise progressive change (Whipps 123 – 130).

Several early women pragmatists seem to anticipate contemporary feminist debates, and formulate concepts, which are part and parcel of today’s theoretical vocabulary. Thus, in “Follett’s Pragmatist Ontology of Relations: Potentials for a Feminist Perspective on Violence,” Amrita Banerjee (2008) makes use of Mary Parker Follett’s work to shed light on the ontological implications of gendered violence. Follett became a leading management consultant in her time, however, she also developed pragmatist theories on politics in works such as The New State (1998). Follett distinguished between ‘power-over’ and ‘power-with’, arguing that “whereas power usually means is possible to develop the conception of power-with, a jointly developed power, a co-active, not a coercive power” (Banerjee 4). While Banerjee employs this reconceptualisation of power in terms of ‘power-over’ and ‘power-with’ in an analysis of gender based violence, it is easy to see how this hybrid understanding of power has become engrained in our contemporary minds, and has been utilised by feminist theorists, peace activists, and others, to advance a more sophisticated comprehension of a variety of political issues.

In this sense, then, early women pragmatists, even when not explicitly feminist, can be engaged by current feminist thinkers in feminist causes and can contribute to critical feminist-pragmatist reflections on problems facing women and men in today’s world. Also, the thematic continuity between early and later women pragmatists – whether they wrote on democracy, international governance, peace, education, community activism, gender roles, or employment – indicates the abundance of theoretical material which can be fruitfully mined by contemporary theorists. Thus, the writings of Addams, Balch, Follett, Gilman, Mitchell, Young, Clapp and Taft constitute a rich legacy for the feminist-pragmatists of today.

2.Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatism

Beyond the conduciveness of early women pragmatist work to contemporary feminist projects, theorists and activists of today also draw upon the work of the male pragmatists. This is because pragmatism, in general, is a tradition which rejects many of the philosophical claims feminists reject, and promotes many of the objectives feminists promote. Due to the extensive proliferation of feminist theory, particularly over the latter part of the twentieth century and into the present, feminists are in a position to bring sophisticated philosophical insights and concepts to bear upon early pragmatist thought. Indeed, many feminist theoretical analyses, which may have developed in isolation from pragmatism, nonetheless find resonance in pragmatist theory and practice. For example, there is a large body of work, in feminist philosophy, on embodiment. Feminists have argued that physicality is often denigrated in our societies, and is theorised as being subservient or inferior to intellect. Pragmatists, such as John Dewey, have rejected this demarcation of body and mind, and oppose the devaluing of the former in favour of the latter. Contemporary feminist-pragmatists, like Shannon Sullivan (2001), have therefore been able to use pragmatist and feminist work to advance feminist-pragmatist theories of embodiment.

Dewey calls such false axiological bifurcations as mind/body dualisms, and he identifies several of these in the history of philosophical thought. Self/environment, change/stasis, universal/particular, thought/practice─all of these are distinctions, which erroneously create oppositionals, with one oppositional being valued at the expense of the other. Feminists have similarly found such dualisms in philosophical theories, and have shown that they hold distinctly gendered implications. Thus, connections have been made between the philosophical denigration of the body in favour of the mind, and the devaluation of women’s bodies in particular (owing to the common identification of womanhood in bodily terms). Feminists can therefore use pragmatist understandings of dualisms to counter the traditional juxtaposition of body and mind, and in conjunction with feminist theoretical insights, can argue against the subjugation of gendered bodies in particular.

Another dualism prevalent in much philosophical thought, is reason/emotion. As several feminist-pragmatists have pointed out, both pragmatists and feminists reject this dualism and recognise the importance of feeling and the affective in our daily interactions with people, while accepting the political potential this may also hold for our societies. Indeed, the feminist re-valuing of the affective has issued in a branch of feminist moral philosophy called care ethics. Charles Sanders Peirce’s work recognises the emotional or felt dimension of thought (Peirce 1934-1963), while William James emphasises the centrality of care and sympathy particularly in women’s lives (James 1983, see also Seigfried 1996). Pragmatist philosophy and care ethics can be mutually conducive bodies of work, allowing feminist-pragmatists to reconceptualise the relationship between reason and emotion, and redressing the skewed favouring of one over the other. Several feminist-pragmatists have done precisely that, by theorising the affective in the context of care ethics and pragmatist thought (see Leffers, 1993; Pappas, 1993; and Seigfried, 1989).

Many feminists, including care ethicists, critique a dominant view of selfhood, which assumes us to be isolated, self-sufficient beings. This abstract individualism attendant in much philosophical theorising is also, however, undermined by pragmatist thinkers. George Herbert Meade, for instance, problematises the development of selves in community with other human beings, and explicitly discusses what is later to become a central theme in feminist theory, that is, self as it exists in relation to the other (1934). Pragmatists reject a clear opposition between self and society, and argue instead that true selfhood can only take place through community. Hence, for pragmatists and feminists, the self needs to be understood with regard to its relationality. This conception of the self and its interdependent existence with others is important both for ontology, and for moral and political philosophy, as our dependency, our sociality, and our power to transform each other hold important implications for debates on gender and liberalism, communitarianism, and libertarianism, amongst others. Thus, theorists such as Judy Whipps (2004) have developed feminist-pragmatist models for comprehending selves in the context of their shared existences with others.

Feminists and pragmatists also oppose the practice/thought dualism alongside the closely related experience/theory dualism. As noted earlier, for many women pragmatists of the classical period, the university setting stifled any real, sustained engagement with experience. This is why they often practiced pragmatism outside of academia, where experience could be focused on more intensively, thereby allowing the reciprocal relationship between theory and practice to really take hold. Today, as well, pragmatism exists outside of the academic world, and this is perhaps why it is such an attractive philosophy for feminists, as feminism also usually entails activism outside of the academy. The intimate relationship between practice and thought is also significant in terms of education, and the early pragmatists, such as Dewey and Addams, developed educational theories which captured the symbiotic nature of doing and thinking (Dewey, 2008 and Addams 2008). These insights are still relevant today, and have epistemological import, especially when coupled with the pragmatist prioritising of pluralism.

For pragmatists, diversity leads to vibrant democracies, however, it also enriches knowledge. Given that women’s knowledge is often dismissed, feminism is fundamentally akin to pragmatism in this respect, as it promotes inclusionary epistemologies, which stem directly from our gendered life experiences. Feminists seek the legitimisation of women’s knowledge through epistemological models, such as standpoint theory, which recognise women’s unique experiences knowable only to them. Pragmatists also reject a bird’s eye view of the world, wherein objective knowledge can be achieved by appealing to singular accounts of the Truth, but instead propose that there are multiple truths. Dewey, for example, views truth as a working hypothesis, which we’ve come, for the time being, to agree upon, but which needs to be continuously reviewed (Dewey, 1986). Pragmatism thus anticipates the post-modern critique of totalising narratives of truth, without falling into an inescapable relativism. Feminism, which has had to come to terms with its own exclusions – in terms of omitting the experiences and attendant truths of women of colour, for example – can utilise pragmatist epistemological insights to its advantage to promote pluralist and egalitarian epistemologies. Several contemporary feminists have proceeded in such a manner to devise feminist-pragmatist approaches to knowledge, building upon pragmatist explanations of , for example, the impetus for thought provided by Addams’s ‘perplexities’ or Peirce’s ‘irritation of doubt’ (see Rooney, 1993). Shannon Sullivan has also developed a feminist-pragmatist standpoint theory with which to overcome the “false dilemma of objectivism and relativism” (Sullivan 211).

The early pragmatists were ardent defenders of democracy, although they eschewed labels and the blind adoption of ideologies. This is due to pragmatism’s meliorism, but also to pragmatism’s view of the world and its inhabitants as constantly evolving. Hence, the dualism of change/stasis is undercut in pragmatist philosophy, as continuity and stability exist simultaneously with dynamism and change. Precisely because metaphysically everything is in the making, should we avoid rigidly clinging to certain structures, as these should not retain their current form. Thus, Dewey recognised that American society had changed immensely since democracy was instituted, and yet, the same out-dated ideas seemed to underpin democracy several hundred years later. For Dewey, this was hugely destructive to the values and aims democracy sought to promote, and he repeatedly criticised the abstract individualism and false universalism attendant in liberal theory, which were originally, perhaps, appropriate, but which hampered the further development of democracy into a more modern ethico-political system (Dewey, 1985). In her book The Task of Utopia, Erin McKenna appropriates Dewey’s adaptive ontology, and draws upon feminist utopian literature to advance a “process model of utopia” which counters the “end-state model of utopia” by positing utopia as always in the making (2001). Contemporary feminist-pragmatists have also developed and extended pragmatist theorising on democracy, and have built upon pragmatism’s espousal of pluralism and the political implications of the often problematic nature of selves in community with others (see Singer 1999, Greene 1999, and  Sullivan 2006).

Finally, it should be noted that there has been feminist engagement with neo-pragmatist philosophers, particularly with Richard Rorty. However, this has sometimes been controversial, as Rorty’s philosophy has been criticised for undermining some of pragmatism’s core principles, including its social and political commitments (Brodsky, 1982). Contemporary feminist-pragmatists have thus critically evaluated Rorty and his post-linguistic turn interpretation of pragmatism, while Rorty, on the other hand, has explicitly problematised feminism’s relationship to deconstructionism and pragmatism (1993). Themes covered in this neo-pragmatist and feminist exchange include masculinist ideology, the rejection of language over experience (Kaufman-Osborn, 1993), and the functioning of power (Bickford, 1993).

3. Conclusion

Feminist-pragmatists of the 21st century benefit from the confluence of feminism and pragmatism, being able to draw upon both feminist and pragmatist theory and practice. Early feminist-pragmatist work, of course, already exhibits a convergence of feminist and pragmatist insights, hence the wealth of material available for ‘mining’ by contemporary feminist-pragmatists. Given that the recovery of women pragmatist work is still ongoing, it is likely that such feminist-pragmatist resources will continue to grow, as more and more women pragmatists are rescued from historical oblivion. In the meantime, though, pragmatists provide the inspiration for many feminist-pragmatists writing on themes dear to the hearts of their feminist-pragmatist predecessors, bringing contemporary feminist concepts and debates to bear upon pragmatist lessons from metaphysics, epistemology, political philosophy, ethics, and philosophy of education.

The philosophical kinship between pragmatism and feminism can also be attributed to both their liberatory aspirations. Early pragmatists, such as Addams, Dewey, and Balch, were part of progressive movements for equality for women and people of colour, for world peace, for increased access to quality education, and for an end to political corruption and economic greed. Contemporary feminist-pragmatists will likely continue pursuing some of these progressive goals, while also trying to achieve new goals arising from the present historical context.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Early Pragmatist and Feminist-Pragmatist Sources

  • Addams, J., Twenty Years at Hull House, Dover, New York, 2008.
  • Addams, J., Writings on Peace, (edited by Fischer, M. & Whipps, J. D.), Continuum London, 2005.
  • Addams, J., Democracy and Social Ethics, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2002a.
  • Addams, J., Peace and Bread in Time of War, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2002b.
  • Addams, J., The Long Road of Woman’s Memory, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2002c.
  • Addams, J. et al., Women at The Hague: The International Congress of Women and its Results, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2003.
  • Balch, E. G. (ed.), Occupied Haiti, New York, Garland Publishing, 1972.
  • Dewey, John, Democracy and Education in John Dewey: The Middle Works, Vol. 9: 1916, Boydston (ed.), Southern Illinois University Press, Carbondale and Edwardsville,    2008
  • Dewey, John, Logic: The Theory of Inquiry in John Dewey: The Later Works, Vol. 12: 1938, Boydston (ed.), Southern Illinois University Press, Carbondale and Edwardsville, 1986.
  • Dewey, John, The Public and its Problems in John Dewey: The Later Works, Vol. 2: 1925 –1927,Boydston (ed.), Southern Illinois University Press, Carbondale and      Edwardsville, 1985.
  • Elshtain, J. B. (ed.), The Jane Addams Reader, Basic Books, New York, 2002.
  • Follett, M. P., The New State: Group Organization the Solution of Popular Government, Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, PA, 1998.
  • James, W., Talks to Teachers on Psychology in The Works of William James, Burkhard et. al., (ed.), Harvard University Press, Cambridge,1983.
  • Meade, G. H., Mind, Self and Society: From the Perspective of  Social Behaviorist, Morris (ed.), University of Chicago Press, Chicago, 1934.
  • Mitchell, Lucy Sprague, Two Lives: The Story of Wesley Clair Mitchell and Myself, Simon and Schuster, New York, 1953.
  • Peirce, C. S., Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, Hartshorne et al. (ed.), Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, Cambridge, 1934-1963.
  • Taft, J., “The Woman Movement as Part of the Larger Social Situation” [excerpt from doctoral thesis “The Woman Movement from the Point of View of Social Consciousness”],Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.

b. Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatist Sources:

i. Introductions or Overviews

  • Duran, J., “The Intersection of Pragmatism and Feminism,” Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Miller, M., “Feminism and Pragmatism: On the Arrival of a ‘Ministry of Disturbance, a     Regulated Source of Annoyance, a Destroyer of Routine, an Underminer of Complacency’”,The Monist, Vol. 75, No. 4, October 1992.
  • Radin, M. J., “The Pragmatist and the Feminist”, Southern California Law Review, Vol. 63, 1990.
  • Seigfried, C. H., Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric, University of Chicago Press, London, 1996.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “Shared Communities of Interest: Feminism and Pragmatism”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993a.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “The Missing Perspective: Feminist Pragmatism”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, Vol. 27, No. 4, Fall 1991.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “Where Are All the Pragmatist Feminists?” Hypatia, Vol. 6, No. 2, Summer 1991.

ii. More Advanced or Specialised Sources

  • Aboulafia, M., “Was George Herbert Mead a Feminist?”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Banerjee, A., “Follett’s Pragmatist Ontology of Relations: Potentials for a Feminist Perspective on Violence,” Journal of Speculative Philosophy, Vol. 22, No. 1, 2008.
  • Bickford, S., “Why We Listen to Lunatics: Antifoundational Theories and Feminist Politics”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993, pp. 104 – 124.
  • Brodsky, G., “Rorty’s Interpretation of Pragmatism”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, Vol. 18, No. 4, pp. 311 – 337.
  • Dewey, Jane, “Biography of Dewey” in The Philosophy of John Dewey, Schilpp et al. (ed.), La Salle, IL, Open Court, 1989, pp. 3 – 46.
  • Deegan, M. J., “‘Dear Love, Dear Love’: Feminist Pragmatism and the Chicago Female World of Love and Ritual”, Gender & Society, Vol. 10, No. 5, October 1996.
  • Fischer, M. et al., Jane Addams and the Practice of Democracy, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2009.
  • Fischer, M., “Addams’s Internationalist Pacifism and the Rhetoric of Maternalism”, NWSA Journal, Vol. 18, No. 3, Fall 2006.
  • Gatens-Robinson, E., “Dewey and the Feminist successor Science Project”, Transactions of  the Charles S. Peirce Society, Vol. 27, No. 4, Fall 1991.
  • Greene, J. M., Deep Democracy: Community, Diversity and Transformation, Rowman & Littlefield, Lanham, MA, 1999.
  • Hamington, M., Feminist Interpretations of Jane Addams, Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, PA, 2010.
  • Hamington, M., The Social Philosophy of Jane Addams, Urbana and Chicago: University of Illinois Press, 2009.
  • Heldke, L., “John Dewey and Evelyn Fox Keller: A Shared Epistemological Tradition”, Hypatia, Vol. 2, No. 3, Fall 1987.
  • Kaufman-Osborn, T. V., “Teasing Feminist Sense from Experience”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993, pp. 124 – 144.
  • Jannack, M., Feminist Interpretations of Richard Rorty, Penn State University Press, University Park, 2010.
  • Leffers, “Pragmatists Jane Addams and John Dewey Inform the Ethic of Care”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Mahowald, M. B., “A Majority Perspective: Feminine and Feminist Elements in American Philosophy”, Cross Currents, Vol. 36, Winter 1986.
  • McKenna, E., The Task of Utopia: A Pragmatist and Feminist Perspective, Rowman & Littlefield, Lanham, MA, 2001.
  • Moen, M. K., “Peirce’s Pragmatism as Resource for Feminism”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, Vol. 27, No. 4, Fall 1991.
  • Pappas, G. F., “Dewey and Feminism: The Affective and Relationships in Dewey’s Ethics”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Rorty, R., “Feminism, Ideology, and Deconstruction: A Pragmatist View”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993, pp. 96 – 103.
  • Rooney, P., “Feminist-Pragmatist Revisionings of Reason, Knowledge, and Philosophy,”  Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Schilpp et al. (ed.), The Philosophy of John Dewey, Open Court, La Salle, IL, 1989.
  • Seigfried, C. H. (ed.), Feminist Interpretations of John Dewey, Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, PA, 2002.
  • Seigfried, C. H. (ed.), Hypatia: Special Issue on Feminism and Pragmatism, Vol. 8, No. 3, Spring 1993.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “Introduction to Jessie Taft, ‘The Woman Movement from the Point of   View of Social Consciousness’”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993b.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “1895 Letter from Harvard Philosophy Department,” Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993c.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “Pragmatism, Feminism, and Sensitivity to Context” in Who Cares? Theory, Research, and Educational Implication of the Ethic of Care, Brabeck (ed.), Praeger, New York, 1989.
  • Singer, B., Pragmatism, Rights and Democracy, Fordham University Press, New York, 1999.
  • Sullivan, S., Revealing Whiteness: The Unconscious Habits of Racial Privilege, Indiana University Press, Bloomington and Indianapolis, 2006.
  • Sullivan, S., “The Need for Truth: Toward a Pragmatist- Feminist Standpoint Theory” in Feminist Interpretations of John Dewey, Seigfried (ed.), Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, PA, 2002.
  • Sullivan, S., Living Across and Through Skins: Transactional Bodies, Pragmatism, and Feminism, Indiana University Press, Bloomington and Indianapolis, 2001.
  • Upin, J., “Charlotte Perkins Gilman: Instrumentalism beyond Dewey,” Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Whipps, J. D., “The Feminist Pacifism of Emily Greene Balch, Nobel Peace Laureate,” NWSA Journal, Vol. 18, No. 3, Fall 2006.
  • Whipps, J. D., “Jane Addams’s Social Thought as a Model for a Pragmatist-Feminist Communitarianism,” Hypatia, Vol. 19, No. 2, Spring 2004.
  • West, C., The American Evasion of Philosophy: A Genealogy of Pragmatism, University of Wisconsin Press, Madison, 1989.


Author Information

Clara Fischer
Trinity College Dublin

Feminism and Race in the United States

This article traces the history of U.S. mainstream feminist thought from an essentialist notion of womanhood based on the normative model of middle-class white women’s experiences, to a recognition that women are, in fact, quite diverse and see themselves differently. It begins with the question of the social construction of gender and the mainstream feminist assumption that ‘woman’ means middle class white woman. The challenge to this assumption is then posed by women of color, poor women, immigrants, lesbians and women in the ’third world.” Section Three presents the various forms of inclusion of black women within mainstream feminist frameworks. Following that is a discussion on the construction of whiteness, the privileges that race afford white women, and feminist strategies to overcome racism within mainstream feminism. Section Five reviews the struggles of Latina and Asian American women, the specific questions of identity they confront, and how these relate to mainstream feminism. Section Six discusses the challenges posed to U.S. mainstream feminism by third world feminists.

Feminists in the U.S. have worked arduously to address the question of difference among women, together with what unites women in common contexts of struggle.  The focus on difference, as well as identity, however, often overlooks the actual lives of many women of color who struggle not so much with how to disabuse themselves of a certain identity, but with how to establish one in the first place.  Concentrating on identity and difference, either by working to obliterate or represent it, also tends to the neglect of power relations that establish, hold apart, and bring together such differences in the first place.

This article further explores how sexism and racism are structural problems endemic to American culture. As such, they need to be addressed systematically, along with class and all other systems of domination. The structural aspect is evident in the ease by which biological racism morphs into cultural racism, spawning condescending and racist attitudes toward third world women, and a blindness of “first world” complicity in third world oppressions. As Audre Lorde has made clear, “the master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house.” The conclusion explores how feminists unite to struggle against systems of domination and exploitation, and work to give up privileges bequeathed by these systems, admittedly an uncomfortable proposition for those benefiting from power, to dismantle the “master’s house” and the multitude of oppressions that it sustains.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Are All Women the Same?
  3. Mainstream Feminism and African American Women in the United States
  4. White Privilege and the Question of Racism in U.S. Mainstream Feminism
  5. Chicana/Latina and Asian American Women and U.S. Mainstream Feminism
  6. Third World Feminisms and Mainstream Feminism in the U.S.
  7. Conclusion: “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions”
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The question of difference has been central to U.S. feminism since the inception of a women’s movement in the United States.  When Sojourner Truth, a black woman, walked into the predominately white Women’s Convention in Akron, Ohio in 1851, three years after the first Women’s Rights Convention in Seneca Falls, New York, jaws dropped. Not a sound could be heard.  Truth was an imposing woman.  She stood almost 6 feet tall and bore the scars of brutal beatings, the sale of her children, and the loss of her own parents while she was sold off into slavery.  Surrounded by affluent, educated white women and their gentlemen supporters, her presence at first stirred fear, but eventually gave rise to awe. The white women at the conference didn’t want to muddy their struggle and demands for women’s rights with the uncomfortable subject of race and the rights of colored folk, despite their debt to Fredrick Douglass’ efforts to keep the controversial issue of women’s suffrage central at the first Convention in Seneca Falls. Yet, when Truth rose to enter into the conversation, her words, collected under the title “Ain’t I a Woman,” not only drew strong admiration, but presaged what would come to be the fundamental question of Western feminism: What exactly is a woman?

In the speech titled “Ain’t I a Woman,” Truth reveals the contradictions inherent to the use and meaning of the term woman, and exposes the political, economic, and cultural assumptions underlying its use.  Taking the platform at the Convention in Ohio, she spoke out against the declarations of several men. They believed that women were to refrain from strenuous work, both physical and mental, so to better fulfill their "womanly nature." But Truth knew nothing of this so-called nature that they espoused and engendered. What she knew was toil and work as arduous as any man could endure.

That man over there says that women need to be helped into carriages, and lifted over ditches, and to have the best place everywhere. Nobody ever helps me into carriages, or over mud-puddles, or gives me any best place! And ain't I a woman?  Look at me! Look at my arm! I have plowed, and planted, and have gathered into barns, and no man could head me! And ain't I a woman? I could work as much, and eat as much as man - when I could get it - and bear the lash as well! And ain't I a woman? I have borne thirteen children and seen most all sold off to slavery, and when I cried out with a mother's grief, none but Jesus heard me! And ain't I a woman?   (Truth, 2009).

Almost one hundred years later, Truth's questioning can be heard in Simone de Beauvoir’s challenge to claims that the meaning of womanhood is self-evident.  In her groundbreaking and canonical work The Second Sex (1949, 1st English trans., 1953), Beauvoir set the course for the subsequent study of the “woman question” in the West by putting the issue of gender into focus. Responding to male discontentment that French women were losing their femininity and were not as "womanly" as they believed Russian women to be, Beauvoir wondered if one is born a woman or whether, in fact, one must become a woman through various socialization and indoctrination processes. This critical perspective led her to challenge the usefulness of the category of woman altogether and to ask whether it was, in fact, helpful as a term representing all the experiences of the so-called members of the "second sex."  Perhaps nothing better illustrates Beauvoir’s concerns regarding the legitimacy and effectiveness of the category of "woman" than the development of white, U.S. mainstream feminist thought in relation to challenges posed by women of color, the poor, lesbians, immigrants, and women from "third world" nations.   In making their voices heard, these marginalized women expanded feminist thinking by showing that ideologies of womanhood had just as much to do with race, class, and sexuality, as they had to do with sex.

2. Are All Women the Same?

Feminists in the U.S. have set out to identify, expose, and subvert the longstanding gender stereotypes that have been used to dominate and subordinate women.  Central to any theory of feminism, then, is how terms like “woman,” “female,” and “feminine” are construed or misconstrued.  The pioneer women in the U.S. suffragist movement spoke of and fought for women’s rights, using the term woman to signify all women.  What they failed to recognize was that their notion of womanhood was modeled on the experiences and problems of a small percentage of females who, like them, were almost exclusively white, middle-class, and relatively well-educated.  However, the assumption that middle-class white women’s experiences represented all women’s experiences was not only made by the early Suffragists, but continued to shape the ideal of womanhood well into the second wave of the American feminist movement and beyond.

In The Problem That Has No Name, a book that helped usher in the second wave of feminism in the U.S., Betty Friedan exposed the hidden frustrations of women who had bought into the “mystique of feminine fulfillment” (2001:24). Trading in their career ambitions for the promised bliss of marriage, motherhood, and domesticity, many women instead found themselves trapped and isolated behind white picket fences in what Friedan described as the “housewife’s syndrome.”  But, what Friedan also failed to recognize was that this syndrome affected only a certain minority of women— namely, those who were white, middle-class, and often highly educated, like herself.   She did not realize that the binary and complimentary gender divisions she assumed, woman as breadmaker and man as breadwinner, were built upon a racialized patriarchy that excluded women of color, the poor, and immigrants from this “mystique of femininity.”   It was these women who would be called upon to leave their children and homes to care for the children and homes of the white women who had successfully “liberated” themselves from domesticity to voluntarily enter into the work force.

Discounting the lives of women of color by assuming that the experiences of white women were representative of the lives of all women, Friedan imagines a unity among women’s experiences that simply does not exist.  According to bell hooks, this ideal of gender solidarity is built upon an assumption of sameness that is supported by the idea that there exists a common oppression of patriarchy around which women must rally.  “The idea of ‘common oppression’ was a false and corrupt platform disguising and mystifying the true nature of women’s varied and complex social reality” (1984:44). This complexity is especially disclosed in the lives of women of color who must contend with multiple and overlapping forms of oppressions--including oppression by white women, who fail to acknowledge the different struggles confronting women who are not like them.

Mainstream feminist thought continues to grapple with the interrelations between gender and race, as well as class, colonialism, imperialism, and issues of sexual orientation in what might arguably be called a third wave of feminism in the U.S..  More importantly, the critiques of women who have suffered the most from sexist societies -- women of color, the poor, third world women -- are now at the forefront of a contemporary, progressive feminist politics.  Thus, to understand the current contours of mainstream feminist thought in the U.S. and the question of race, one must look at how feminist theory and practice have addressed differences among women, and the specific ways that differences within women’s lives have shaped their relationships to mainstream U.S. feminism.

3. Mainstream Feminism and African American Women in the United States

Feminist theorists have addressed the relationship of race and feminism in at least two different ways. One approach is to view race as integral to gender and explore the ways in which gender identity is constructed in relation to race, and how racial identity is equally constructed in relation to gender.  The other follows a method whereby the voices of women of color are added to the conventional curriculum in a sort of separate but equal manner. This latter approach has been called the “additive” approach. Because it simply adds the voices of those historically excluded from the mainstream feminist canon, but does not examine the constitution of these voices within the contexts of power that have given rise to them, it carries the risk of essentializing gender and race, or assuming these categories to be fixed and timeless.

With respect to the former, Jacquelyn Dowd Hal highlights the interconnections of race and gender in her discussion of lynching. Hal shows that lynching was not only used to enforce labor contracts, maintain racial etiquette and the socio-economic status quo, but was also effective in re-inscribing gender roles among whites. White men cast themselves as protectors of white women, sheltering them from the presumed threat of black male sexual prowess, while simultaneously securing white women’s adherence to ideals of chastity and femininity (Brooks-Higginbootham, 1989: 132).  These ideals were further re-inscribed by white women in their perceptions and accusations regarding black male sexuality.  Ida B. Wells had made the same observation, arguing that white men maintained their ownership over white women’s bodies by using them as the terrain for lynching black males (Carby, 1986: 309). It comes as little surprise, then, that by joining anti-lynching campaigns white women were not only defending black males, but simultaneously reacting against Southern chivalry and their roles as fragile sex objects (Brooks-Higginbootham, 1989: 133).

The more popular approach to the question of race and feminism, however, seems to have been the "additive" approach.  In “Toward a Black Feminist Criticism” (1977), Barbara Smith embarks on a journey that she states no man or woman has gone on before: documenting black women’s experience and culture while providing black women with a resource for reading about their lives. “It is galling that ostensible feminists and acknowledged lesbians have been so blinded to the implications of any womanhood that is not white womanhood and that they have yet to struggle with the deep racism in themselves that is at the source of this blindness” (Carby, 1992: 158).  Smith believes that it is necessary both to retrieve the writings of black women and to place them before black feminist literary critics who are able to interpret these writers experiences.  She argues that black women writers share a singular tradition of styles, themes and aesthetics that are rooted in a shared culture of oppression.  Furthermore, she believes that these themes are expressed in a uniquely black woman’s language that is accessible only to black feminist literary critics who simply need turn inwards, or towards their own lived experiences, in order to decipher the messages told by black women writers (Carby, 1992:164). With her novel idea of an “identity politics,” Smith went on to form the black lesbian feminist Combahee River Collective in Boston.

“The Combahee River Collective Statement” (1986), along with This Bridge Called My Back, Writings by Radical Women of Color, published two years earlier, gave voice to women of color and served as the primary texts from which white women and women of color would draw in discussions of race and gender.  In the Combahee Statement, the Collective explained their need to organize and come together as black women into a movement for black women. “We realize that the only people who care enough about us to work consistently for our liberation is us.  Our politics evolve from a healthy love for ourselves, our sisters, and our community, which allows us to continue our struggle and our work” (1995: 21-22). Black-only movements worked to raise the self-esteem of black women and address specific problems confronting all black people. Angela Davis also describes how, despite the sexist and heterosexist elements of the Black Nationalist Movement, it gave her a framework within which to understand herself as beautiful and valuable. In addition, Black Nationalism also served to counter racist images of African-Americans by providing positive images of Africa.  “I was able to construct a psychological space within which I could ‘feel good about myself.’ I could celebrate my body (especially my nappy hair, which I always attacked with a hot comb in ritualistic seclusion), my musical proclivities and my suppressed speech patterns, among other things…This distanced me from the white people around me while simultaneously rendering controllable the distance I had always felt from them” (1992:319).

Patricia Hill Collins invokes the notion of a shared black women’s language and highlights a common tradition that reaches back to the idea of an "African consciousness." However, she cautions against carving out a uniquely black female voice, or category of experience, for fear of sliding into an essentialist perspective which may, ultimately, be counterproductive. She recognizes that identifying a black feminist thought problematically assumes that "being Black and/or female generates certain experiences that automatically determine the variants of a Black and/or feminist consciousness” (1991:21). Still, Collins maintains that black women have certain perspectives that arise out of a shared experience, along with a different relation to knowledge production that give rise to a uniquely “black feminist standpoint” (1991:21-22).

Collins draws on the mainstream feminist strategy of “standpoint theory” that Nancy Hartsock helped develop out of Karl Marx’s insight that the material conditions of existence structure one's lived experiences,. A standpoint theory argues that the place from which one stands influences the perspective or view that one has of the world; and, further, that those who are most oppressed are able to provide a broader and clearer perspective on the whole of society and societal relations (Hartsock, 1999).  Collins believes that any black feminist standpoint must take into account white domination, the concomitant struggle for self-definition, and the Afrocentric worldview that helps blacks cope with racial domination. This Afrocentricism, Collins claims, existed prior to,and is independent of, racial oppression. Moreover, it has given rise to traditions of storytelling and narrative that value concrete, lived experience, as well as black women’s community and sisterhood (1991:206, 212). Collins’ version of standpoint feminism, therefore, focuses on concrete lived experiences that have their roots in African oral traditions, black families, churches, and other black organizations.

But even the idea of this mitigated account of an essential black female identity does not sit well with many black women. For example, Hazel Carby sees the idea of black feminist criticism, as well as any notion of a specifically black feminist consciousness, as a problem and not a solution. She traces this problem to the processes whereby one finds academic legitimation by aiming to fit into certain allotted slots that are open for discussions of racial and gender identity within mainstream curricula.  Carby advocates the need to examine racism and sexism not as trans-historical and essentialist categories, but as historical practices which are enmeshed with evolving sets of social, political, and economic practices that function to maintain power in a given context and society (1989:18).  Any emphasis on the elaboration of standpoint theory, Carby claims, sanctions the segregation and ghettoization of race and gender, while simultaneously positing white women as a normative standard (1992:193 ).

Moreover, Carby believes that this supplemental approach, which consists simply in adding the experiences and writings of women of color to the established mainstream feminist canon, will not solve the problems of “exclusion” from mainstream feminism, but will instead further reify differences.  Joan Scott echoes these remarks and cautions women against relying on an uncritical deployment of experience to tell their stories.  By assuming experience to be self-evident and transparent, one naturalizes difference and leaves unexamined the constitutive mechanisms according to which people’s experiences have been historically constructed by relational webs of power and multiple oppressions (1991: 25-26).   These mechanisms are structural and institutional. They are therefore more difficult to identify and eradicate. To adequately address the root causes of racism in the feminist movement, women must therefore acknowledge that any attempt to universalize their experiences colludes, not only with ideologies of white womanhood, but also with the dominant and privileged white male norms.  The prominence given to white women’s experience, Carby points out, is no accident. “White women are made visible because they are the women that white men see” (1986: 302). Taking into account the historical and political contexts that define gender reveals the racial constructions that structure both the lives of whites and people of color.

Many black women, especially those excluded from the earlier Suffragist movement, went even further and drew an explicit link between imperialism, racism, and patriarchy. This link was cemented at the 1893 World’s Columbian Exposition in Chicago, where a group of black women who had thought they were there to represent the lives of American women, were instead made part of exhibits featuring “exotic” peoples, which further fed into racist stereotypes and fears (Carby, 1986).  Subsequently, these women came to recognize the need to form their own national organizations.  In 1896, a number of black women’s groups merged into the National Association of Colored Women (NACW), headed by Josephine Ruffin and Mary Church Terrell. Its members included Harriet Tubman, Frances E.W. Harper, and Ida Bell Wells-Barnett. Harper and Anna J Cooper, the fourth African American woman to earn a Doctorate in the U.S., saw an inseparable link between imperialism, domestic racial oppression, and unrestrained patriarchal power. Cooper writes in A Voice from the South: By A Woman from the South (1892):

“Whence came this apotheosis of greed and cruelty? Whence this sneaking admiration we all have for bullies and prizefighters?  Whence the self-congratulation of ‘dominant’ races, as if ‘dominant’ meant ‘righteous’ and carried with it a title to inherit the earth? Whence the scorn of so-called weak or unwarlike races and individuals, and the very comfortable assurance that it is their manifest destiny to be wiped out as vermin before the advancing civilization?” (Carby, 1986:305).

Cooper’s observations came 40 years after Arthur de Gobineau declared in The Inequality of Races, that, indeed, Africans were “incapable of civilization” because they did not have the drive or ambition to conquer their neighbors, but rather lived “side by side in complete independence of each other” (Bernasconi, 2000:47). It was this conquering drive that Gobineau argued marked European civilization as advanced in contrast to the backwardness of Africans, who practiced living in harmonious co-existence with their neighbors.

In recognition of the advantages that race has conferred upon white women, many feminists have embarked upon analyses of race and gender that moves towards an acknowledgment of white privilege and racial injustice. Feminists have also worked to develop strategies for addressing white racism and identifying power differentials between women, between men, and among white women and men of color.

4. White Privilege and the Question of Racism in U.S. Mainstream Feminism

In 1988, inspired by the model of how men gain advantage from women’s disadvantage, Peggy McIntosh began to document some of the ways in which white women have benefited from racism.  Having observed how men were taught not to recognize their male privilege, McIntosh explored some of the unconscious avenues that allow white women not to recognize their “unearned skin privilege” (2008:63). “[W]hites are taught to think of their lives as morally neutral, normative, and average, and also ideal, so that when we work to benefit others, this work is seen as work that will allow ‘them’ to be more like ‘us’” (2008:63). Positioning whites as the norm is seen by Anna Stubblefield as pivotal to securing the superiority of whites. “The ideology of white supremacy is that whiteness sets the standard—whiteness is normative—such that anything that is symbolic of or associated with blackness is therefore deviant”  (2005:74).

McIntosh describes how she was taught to view racism as prejudice or bigotry, and to subscribe discriminatory acts of cruelty to isolated individuals, rather than to acknowledge “invisible systems conferring racial domination on my group from birth” (2008:68). She lists the unearned advantages that come from being a member of the dominant group, such as the comfort that comes from being in situations that reflect the worldview, values, and ideals of whites. White privilege ranges from the confidence white parents have that their children will receive educational materials highlighting the accomplishments and contributions of their race, to not attributing acts of injustice to racial prejudices, and not having to stand as a representative for one’s particular racial group. Marilyn Frye further discusses the privilege that whites have to define or determine how others will see them. More specifically, she contrasts the images and ideals that whites have of themselves with the ways in which they are viewed by men and women of color to underscore the disparity in perceptions (2001:85).  Because whites are taught that they are moral, honest, and fair, they believe that they alone are capable of and responsible for teaching others about what is right and wrong. This confidence is built upon a body of established Western principles, codes, and rules that presume to guarantee the correctness of their moral judgments. However, these self-descriptions of the dominant racial group are not shared by the majority of people of color who view many whites as behaving arbitrarily, or in a self-serving, violent, and often oppressive ways.

In “The Whiteness Question” (2005), Linda Alcoff argues that the key to overcoming racism lies in a confrontation with the “psychic processes of identity formation[.]”  Tracing the origins of whiteness to domination and exploitation, Alcoff asserts that “whiteness” is inseparable from the subjection, denigration, objectification, and repudiation of those who are perceived as non-white. “The very genealogy of whiteness was entwined from the beginning with a racial hierarchy, which can be found in every major cultural narrative from Christopher Columbus to Manifest Destiny to the Space Race and the Computer Revolution”  (2005). Before the concept of race originated in the 16th century, various populations of people identified and structured their communities in varieties of ways that did not include reference to skin color.  The origins of the category of race are, indeed, the origins of European expansion and oppression against Africans, Asians, indigenous peoples in the Americas and Australia, and even Muslims.  According to G.W.F. Hegel, it is only Europeans, or, more precisely, Christians who are able to attain the highest level of reason and spirituality by distancing themselves from the “absolute” through rationality.   Africans are not able to actualize these higher mental and spiritual faculties because they fetishize the absolute by objectifying it in relics that they then toss away when their fetish fails to come to their aid.  Muslims too, while successful at raising God above the level of the sensuous, are nevertheless unable to bring God back down to earth and unite the universal with the concrete, and therefore are unable to attain self-conscious reason (Bernasconi, 2000).

Alcoff, therefore, concludes that white collective self-esteem and identity are rooted in forms of white supremacy. Thus, to break free from racist ideology may not be such an easy task for whites, as it threatens the very foundations of their pride and self-love. This threat arises from the acknowledgement that historical achievements, and the legacy of cultural resources from which a white identity is drawn, are steeped in practices of racial oppression and domination. Consequently, relinquishing racism means not only giving up the actual privileges and benefits that are associated with being white, but may involve shunning one's ties to a cultural history upon which white personal esteem and sense of self are grounded.  Feelings of hysteria, shame, and anxiety often accompany this break.  Yet, belonging to a history is crucial to one’s esteem and identity. Alcoff, therefore, suggests a form of “white double consciousness” that moves from a recognition of practices of domination, exploitation, and discrimination to “a newly awakened memory of the many white traitors to white privilege who have struggled to contribute to the building of an inclusive human community. The Michelangelos stand beside the Christopher Columbuses, and Michael Moores next to the Pat Buchanans” (2005).

The interrelationship between white identity and white supremacy has lead some anti-racist whites, most notably Noel Ignatiev, to go further and to call for the overall abolition of the white race: “Treason to whiteness is loyalty to humanity” (1997). Marilyn Frye similarly advocates a disassociation from “whiteness” by calling for whites to opt out of the club she calls “whiteliness” (2001: 85). The very conditions for disclaiming whiteness, a disclaiming of identity that some women of color point out is possible only for whites, rests in the understanding that race is something socially constructed.  Frye explains that being white “is like being a member of a political party, or a club, or a fraternity—or being a Methodist or a Mormon” (2001:85).

The possibility of relinquishing "whiteliness," therefore, involves a recognition of its contingency, and depends upon the repudiation of practices that arise from enacting, embodying and animating whiteness. Transforming consciousness is one step toward eliminating whiteliness.  However, Frye and McIntosh are clearly aware that reflection and reorientation address only a fraction of the problems associated with race, since most of these are stubbornly structural and institutional. Still, Linda Gordon fears that a failure to begin addressing these difficult problems merely contributes towards legitimating more of the same—whites talking only about themselves (1991).

Sarita Srivastava is similarly unhappy with the direction that discussions of race have taken insofar as they tend toward white self-examination and constructions of whiteness. When analysis of race and racism occurs in feminist organizations, the emphasis, she finds, often falls on white guilt rather than organizational change. This results in self-centered strategies by whites to correct their moral self-image, an image that sustains inequalities, and, Srivastava argues, is rooted in the very foundations of feminism, imperialism, and nationalism that are the target of change.(2005: 36). Rather than work directly to alter the order of racial oppression, white women instead strive to empathize with the victims. Empathy serves to underscore white women’s “goodness,” and transforms the essentially socio-political nature of the problem to a more personal one. This practice further reinforces decades of racist and colonialist practices by validating white women’s moral authority and their belief that they have somehow been entrusted with the responsibility to educate and liberate those less civilized (2005: 44). Thus, Srivastava argues that white women fail to genuinely confront their own racism by focusing on their guilt and, in doing so, maintain power inequities.  She quotes a woman of color’s frustration over white women’s refusal to look at their racism during political discussions on the topic of race.  “The indignant response, anger, the rage that turns to tears, the foot stomping, temper tantrum, which are very typical responses [to being called racist]. Every single organization that I have been in, every single one. So I realized that it wasn’t about me…after awhile [laughter]” (2005: 42-43).

Alcoff further shows how white feminists distance themselves from a serious critique of racism by focusing on behavior modification, rather than challenging oppressive institutional structures and calling for wealth redistribution.  In her analysis of Judith Katz’s White Awareness: Handbook for Anti-Racism Training (Katz 1978), Alcoff describes Katz’s depiction of how she came to terms with the depth of her own racism as a painful, demoralizing process that threatened her self-trust.  While Katz warns against wallowing in white guilt, she nonetheless links anti-racism to psychological liberation while, at the same time, distancing herself from the workings and mechanisms of racist practices that are endemic to the culture. The focus on difference and overcoming of difference, either by obliterating or representing it, tends to neglect the power relations that establish, hold apart, and bring together such differences in the first place. Concentrating on identity and difference also overlooks the actual lives of many women of color who struggle, not so much with how to disabuse themselves of a certain identity, but, to the contrary, with how to establish an identity in the first place.

5. Chicana/Latina and Asian American Women and U.S. Mainstream Feminism

Struggling to negotiate and come to terms with an identity, many women of color are not as eager as white women to give up their racial or ethnic distinctiveness. “To be oppressed,” Norma Alarcon explains, “means to be disenabled not only from grasping an ‘identity’, but also from reclaiming it” (1995:364).  Moreover, specific histories of oppressions have positioned women differently with regard to gender roles and the family.  Cherrie Moraga describes how Latina women’s relationships to ideals of gender and motherhood have been uniquely shaped by colonization. Accompanying European expansion and colonization, was the concomitant threat of genocide. The fear of extinction strengthened the commitment to traditional family ideals and roles, such as encouraging women to be pregnant and assuming males at the head of the household.  “At all costs, la familia must be preserved…We believe the more severely we protect the sex roles with the family, the stronger we will be as a unity in opposition to the anglo threat” (1995:181). Consequently, Moraga explains, Latina feminists’ relation to gender roles and the structure of the family confront a very particular kind of resistance.  While mainstream feminists are challenging traditional sex roles of men and women, some Latina feminists, due to their certain histories of colonization, seek to preserve these roles.  Thus, Latina women’s concerns are often foreign to, and often in direct opposition to, mainstream white feminists who seek to abolish or overcome conventional forms of gender identity, especially within the family.

U.S. immigration policies and discriminatory practices against Asian Americans have also sometimes lead to the embracing of gender ideals among Asian American women that are in opposition to the ideals of many white feminists in the U.S..  Ester Ngan-Ling Chow shows how racism, colonialism, and imperialism have worked to position Asian American women differently toward Asian American men, feminism, and Westernization.  Addressing the apparent lack of feminist consciousness and activism in Asian American women, she attributes this deficit to ethnic pride and solidarity with Asian American men to end racial discrimination against Asians in the U.S..  Asian American men, for example, often view Asian American women’s engagement with mainstream U.S. feminism as a threat to the Asian American community.  Chow also points to specific Asiatic values of obedience, filial duty, loyalty, fatalism, and self-control that encourage forms of submissiveness among Asian American women that are incompatible with American values of individualism and self-assertiveness.  The force of traditional Asian values contributes to the particularity of Asian American women’s struggles, and work to distance their struggle from the concerns of the mainstream, white feminist movement. These differences, among others, are why Chow states: “The development of feminist consciousness for Asian American women cannot be judged or understood through the experience of White women” (1991:266).

Yen Le Espiritu further discusses the complexities surrounding the intersections of race, class, and gender confronting Asian American women.  Regrettably, some Asian American women find themselves victims of the discrimination faced by Asian American men.  Among other things, Espiritu writes, racial ideology defines Asian American men as feminine and weak—a rendering that incidentally works to confirm the notion that manhood is white.  Frustrated also by the higher value placed on Asian American women’s employability, some Asian American men try to assert their power by physically abusing the women and children in their lives.  Breathing humor into these problems of physical abuse, Espiritu draws upon a joke that gets a laugh from both men and women. “When we get on the plane to go back to Laos, the first thing we will do is beat up the women!’” (Espiritu, 1997: 136). Despite the discriminations Asian American women endure within their community, they too often find it difficult to juggle between the desire to expose male privilege, and the desire to unite with men in their shared struggle against prejudice and discrimination.

Gloria Anzaldua describes the particular ways that a feminist consciousness is developed by Latina women who many times find themselves struggling to arrive at a positive image of themselves.  She explains how an internalization of racism and colonialist mentality has given rise to shame, self-hatred, and abuse of other Latina women in various communities. Self-hatred and the hatred one has towards others like oneself are further ignited by jostling for the limited positions of superiority that are open to women of color.  Here is where ethnic and cultural identity begin to be conflated with race and purported biological distinctions.  In the early phases of colonialism, European colonizers flexed their powers overtly in order to destroy the fabric, legal codes, cultural systems, mannerisms, language and habits of the colonized under the guise of civilizing the “savage natives.”  Slowly, local inhabitants internalized Western values, attitudes, and ways of life, including racialized thinking that resulted in a desire for some Latin Americans to become more white and reject their indigenous cultures.  “Like them we try to impose our version of ‘the ways things should be’, we try to impose one’s self on the Other by making her the recipient of one’s negative elements, usually the same elements that the Anglo projected on us” (1995: 143).

More graphically, Anzaldua alludes to how the “forced cultural penetration” of rape has, so to speak, inseminated white values into the bodies of women of color (1995:143). A Latina woman with lighter skin who does not speak the language of her ancestors is often held suspect by other Latina women and cast out of the community.  Anzaldua attributes this exclusionary practice to an “internalized whiteness that desperately wants boundary lines (this part of me is Mexican, this Indian)[.]” (1995: 143). In opposition to the Enlightenment fantasy of a uniform and self-contained subject, Anzaldua introduces the concept of “mestiza consciousness,” a consciousness of the Borderlands that captures the multiplicity and plurality of Latina consciousness. “From this racial, ideological, cultural and biological cross-pollinization, an ‘alien’ consciousness is presently in the making—a new mestiza consciousness, una conciencia de mujer” (2008: 870). Writing primarily in English but peppering her discussion of mestiza consciousness with phrases in Spanish, Anzaldua puts the non-Spanish reader in an uncomfortable position, paralleling the discomfort felt by many immigrants who are confronted with a language they don’t understand.  In this way, Anzaldua describes and invokes an appreciation of the inner conflict that those straddling two or more cultures, languages, and value systems experience.  She provides a provocative illustration of warring cultures that produce in their subjects a “psychic restlessness” (2008).

The notion of a splintered personality brought on by a collision of cultures is also addressed by Alcoff, who proposes a positive reconstruction of mixed race identities whereby one finds comfort in ambiguity and a contentment with living the “gap” (2000:160). “I never reach shore: I never wholly occupy either the Angla or the Latina identity.  Paradoxically, in white society I feel my Latinness, in Latin society I feel my whiteness, as that which is left out, an invisible present, sometimes as intrusive as an elephant in the room and sometimes more as a pulled thread that alters the design of my fabricated self” (2000:160).

Maria Lugones gives a phenomenological description of what it is like to shift between identities as a person of mixed race or a hyphenated identity.  When voluntarily embraced, she calls this practice of shifting identities “world traveling.”  “Those of us who are ‘world’- travelers have the distinct experience of being different in different ‘worlds’ and ourselves in them” (1995: 396). Lugones’ concept of world traveling arose out of her awareness of the different levels of comfort she experiences in embodying different identities in distinct worlds. In some worlds, Lugones observes she is more playful and not overly concerned with how others view her. However, while inhabiting a world in which her identity is constructed negatively, or strictly on the basis of her ethnicity, she finds she is less playful and may even begin to animate self-defeating stereotypes.

Shifting in and out of various worlds, Lugones advocates a strategy whereby women attempt to empathize with each other by trying to stand in one another’s shoes. Laurence Thomas, to the contrary, warns against such a strategy that asks people who are so differently positioned within society to try to identify with each other’s experiences. Instead, he introduces the model of “moral deference”: “the act of listening that is preliminary to bearing witness to another’s moral pain, but without bearing witness to it” (1986: 377). In this stance, the one suffering has the platform and the one listening, who does not inhabit the same socially constituted identity, cedes the platform by recognizing the incommensurability of his or her experience of the other’s pains and struggles. It is this respect – rooted in an acknowledgment of the irreducibility of lived experience—that is at the heart of Third World Women’s appeal to Western Feminists.

6. Third World Feminisms and Mainstream Feminism in the U.S.

Significantly, the concerns raised by women of color in the U.S. are almost identically replayed by third world women, in what might be called a shift from biological to cultural racism.  However, instead of fighting against a cultural norm of white womanhood, third world feminists are fighting to assert their difference in opposition to a monolithic and dominant notion of Western feminism that is increasingly gaining legitimacy by controlling how women in the third world are represented.

Chandra Talpade Mohanty raises awareness of the impact of Western Scholarship on third world women “in a context of a world system dominated by the West[.]” (1991:53).  She encourages Western feminist scholarship to situate itself within the current Western hegemony over the production, publication, distribution, and consumption of information, and to examine its role within this context (1991:55).   In her analysis of the representations of third world women in nine texts in the Zed Press “Women in the Third World” series, Mohanty finds that in almost all these texts women are monolithically represented as victims of an unchanging patriarchy. These representations uproot women from their lived situations and the practices that shape, and are shaped by them. “The crucial point that is forgotten is that women are produced through these very relations as well as being implicated in forming these relations” (1991:59).

When women’s lives and struggles are not historically and locally situated, they are robbed of their political agency.  Those, then, writing about third world women “become the true ‘subjects’ of this counterhistory” (1991:71).  Western scholarship must, therefore, recognize the ethnocentric universalism it assumes in encoding and representing all third world women as victims of an ahistorical and decontextualized notion of patriarchy that results in a homogenous notion of the oppressed third world women. Only when feminist thinkers examine their role within Western dominations can genuine progress be made.

Uma Narayan highlights the facticity of women’s historical situations in her exposition of the particularities that women in the third world confront in participating in a feminist movement.  Because of the histories of colonialism and imperialism, suspicions against feminist movements as possible instruments of colonial domination surround attempts made by women to organize for change. Specifically, Narayan explores how the term Westernization is used to silence critiques by third world feminists regarding the status and treatment of women in their communities.  Ironically, it is Western educated and assimilated men in the third world that are spearheading these attacks against third world feminists by accusing them of disrespecting their culture and embracing Western values and customs. Narayan rejects the implication that feminism is foreign to the third world, noting that historical and political circumstances that raise awareness of women’s oppression give rise to a feminist consciousness that is organic to third world women’s lives.

Minoo Moallem locates a “feminist imperialism” in Western women’s desire to  enlighten third world women to the civilizing project of the West, wherein first world women become the norm and third world women get constructed as a singular, non-Western other (2006).   Elora Shehabuddin identifies a feminist imperialism in Western women’s attempt to position themselves as the saviors of Muslim women, thereby ignoring women’s voices fighting to make change within the Muslim world  “In presenting change in the Muslim world as possible only with the intervention from the United States—either by force through the violent eradication of oppressive Muslim men or the less dramatic support of ‘moderate’ Muslim groups and individuals—these writers foreclose the possibility of change from within Muslim societies” (2011: 121).

Ignoring the racism inherent in colonialist narratives documenting the oppression of Muslim women by Muslim men, Shehabuddin points out, Western feminists are content to draw on stories of abuse by a few vocal “Muslim escapees” as representative of the victimization of all Muslim women.  What seems to be the primary concern of these Western feminists is not the actual lives of women in the Muslim world, but the assertion of their own moral authority, exercised in presumably righting the sexism in the Islamic world.   In this way, Western feminists repeat and redirect their racism and condescension toward Muslim women and third world women in general, while conveniently avoiding the sexism and oppression in their own backyards.  The remedy to cultural racism is an acknowledgement of it and a commitment to displace Eurocentricism by actually listening to women’s experiences, and engaging women in the hopes of opening up a dialogue.  Shehabuddin writes: “In the end, the only way to find out ‘what Muslim women want’ is to listen to them, not by assuming their needs and concerns are self-evident because they identify as Muslims and not by taking a small group of vocal, articulate individuals—whose opinions on issues like Israel and the war on terror are more acceptable—as the representative and authentic voices” (2011: 132).

7. Conclusion: “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions”

The history of U.S. feminist thought has evolved from an essentialist notion of womanhood based on the normative model of middle-class white women’s experiences to a recognition that women are, in fact, quite diverse and see themselves differently. “The real problem of feminism,” states Elizabeth Spellman, “is how it has confused the condition of one group of women with the condition of all women” (1988:15 ). In assuming that the experiences of middle-class white women represented the lives of all women, a false unity and solidarity among women was presupposed. Taking account of the multiple and overlapping forms of oppression that many women, especially women of color and third world women must negotiate, reveals the complexity and diversity of women’s lives.  Women of color in the U.S., for example, not only define themselves in a struggle against white men and men of color, but also in resistance to white women.  The same holds for third world women who find themselves fighting against the omission of their experiences and the overarching assumptions made by “first world” feminists regarding their needs and the forms of subordination they confront.  Moving away from a monolithic notion of woman, U.S. feminist theory and practice engages difference by focusing on context-specific positionings of women in relation to other constantly changing categories. But some women worry that without a commonality uniting women the power to make changes will be lost.

To address the complexity of the multitude of oppressions confronting women, Mohanty suggests a model based on “imagined communities of women” organized by “the way we think about race, class, and gender—the political links we choose to make among and between struggles” (1991:4). In these communities, political alliances are formed not by a person’s race or sex, but on the basis of “common contexts of struggle against specific exploitative structures[.]” (1991:7) Today, U.S. mainstream feminism is engaged with recognizing diversity and forming cross-cultural coalitions against injustices. The recognition of difference, however, is not complete without a further commitment to making institutional change.

Like sexism, racism is a problem that is structural and endemic to American culture and needs to be addressed systematically, along with class and all other systems of domination.  As Robert Bernasconi notes, “Personal attitudes are not the main source of the problem and they cannot provide the solution” (2005: 20).  The structural aspect is evident in the ease by which biological racism morphs into cultural racism, spawning condescending and racist attitudes toward third world women and a blindness of first world complicity in various forms of third world oppressions.  Indeed, as Audre Lorde has made clear, “the master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house.”   However, by waging struggles against systems of domination and exploitation and assuming responsibility to actively give up the privileges bequeathed by these systems, admittedly an uncomfortable proposition, U.S. feminists embark upon dismantling the master’s house and the multitude of oppressions that it sustains.

Still, a change in personal attitudes does go a long way. When mainstream feminists recognize the interconnections between gender, race, nationalism and class, Espiritu writes, “then they can better work with, and not for, women (and men) of color” (Espiritu, 1997: 140).  In sum, feminists in the U.S. have worked arduously to address the question of difference among women, as well as what unites women in common contexts of struggle.   In the early twentieth century, Emma Goldman wrote of the significance of recognizing and respecting differences, while at the same time working together in spite of these differences to challenge institutional inequalities that prevent individuals from living together in a free society.  Goldman laid out a vision for a way forward that goes beyond the mere tolerance of difference when she said: “The problem that confronts us today and which the nearest future is to solve, is how to be one’s self and yet in oneness with the others, to feel deeply with all human beings and still retain one’s own characteristic qualities” (1973: 509).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Alarcon, N.,  “The Theoretical Subject(s) of This Bridge Called My Back and Anglo-American Feminism” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Alcoff, L., “Chapter 9: The Whiteness Question”  Linda Martin-Alcoff, 2005.
  • Alcoff, L., The Idea of Race, (eds.) Bernasconi, R. and Lott,T., Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.
  • Anzaldua, G., “La Conciencia de la Mestiza/Towards a New Consciousness,” in The Feminist Philosophy Reader, (eds.) Bailey, A. and Cuomo, C., New York: McGraw Hill, 2008.
  • Anzaldua, G., “En Rapport, In Opposition: Cobrando cuentas a las neustras,” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Bernasconi, R. “Waking up White and in Memphis” in White on White/Black on Black (ed.) Yancy, G., Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 2005.
  • Brooks-Higginbotham, E., “The Problem of Race in Women's History,” in Coming to Terms: Feminism, Theory, Politics, (ed.) Weed, E., New York: Routledge, 1989.
  • Carby, H., “On the Threshold of Woman’s Era: Lynching, Empire, and Sexuality in Black Feminist Theory,” in Race, Writing and Difference, (ed) Gates, H.L, University of Chicago Press: Chicago, 1986.
  • Carby, H., “The Multicultural Wars,” in Black Popular Culture, (ed.) Dent, G., Bay Press: Washington, 1992.
  • Carby, H. Reconstructing Womanhood: The Emergence of the Afro-American Woman Novelist, U.S.A: Oxford University Press, 1989
  • Collins, P.H., Black Feminist Thought, New York: Routledge, 1991.
  • Combahee River Collective, “A Black Feminist Statement The Combahee River Collective” in Words of Fire: An Anthology of African-American Feminist Thought, (ed) Guy-Sheftall, B., New Press, 1995.
  • Davis, A., “Black Nationalism: The Sixties and the Nineties,” in Black Popular Culture, (ed.) Dent, G., Bay Press: Washington, 1992.
  • Espiritu, Yen Le, “Race, Class and Gender in Asian America” in Making More Waves: New Writings by Asian American Women, eds. Elaine H. Kim, Lilia V. Villanueva, and Asian Women United of California, Beacon Press Books: Boston, 1997.
  • Friedan, B. The Feminine Mystique, New York: Dell Publishing Inc., 1974.
  • Frye, M., “White Woman Feminist 1983-1992,” in Race and Racism, (ed.), B. Boxill, U.S.A: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • de Gobineau, A., "The Inequality of Human Races," in The Idea of Race (eds.) Bernasconi, R. and Lott, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.
  • Goldman, E. “The Tragedy of Woman’s Emancipation,” in The Feminist Papers: From Adams to de Beauvoir, (ed.) Ross, A. S., Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1973.
  • Gordon, L., “On Difference,” Genders 10, Spring 1991.
  • Grande, S., “Whitestream Feminism and the Colonialist Project: A Review of Contemporary Feminist Pedagogy and Praxis,” Educational Theory, Summer 2003,Volume 53, Number 3.
  • Hartsock, Nancy, The Feminist Standpoint Revisited, And Other Essays (Basic Books, 1999), pp. 105-133.
  • Hooks, b., Feminist Theory: From Margin to Center, Boston: South End Press, 1984.
  • Ignatiev, N., “The Point Is Not To Interpret Whiteness But To Abolish It” in Race Traitor, ed. Noel Ignatiev, 1997.
  • Lorde, A. “The Master’s Tools Will Never Dismantle the Master’s House,” in This Bridge Called My Back: Writings by Radical Women of Color, (eds.) Moraga, C. and Anzaldua, Kitchen Table- Women of Color Press, 1984.
  • Lorde, A. “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions,” Illvox, May 12, 2008.
  • Lugones, M. “Playfulness, ‘World’-Travelling, and Loving Perception” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • McIntosh, P., “White Privilege and Male Privlege,” in The Feminist Philosophy Reader, (eds.) Bailey, A. and Cuomo, C., New York: McGraw Hill, 2008.
  • Moallem, M., “Feminist Scholarship and the Internationalization of Women’s Studies,” Feminist Studies 32, no. 2 (Summer 2006) 334
  • Mohanty, C. “Introduction: Cartographies of Struggle: Third World Feminism and the Politics of Feminism” in Third World Women and the Politics of Feminism, (eds.) Mohanty, C., Russo, A., Torres, L., Indiana University Press, 1991.
  • Mohanty, C., “Under Western Eyes: Feminist Scholarship and Colonial Discourses” in Third World Women and the Politics of Feminism, (eds.) Mohanty, C., Russo, A., Torres, L. (eds.) Indiana University Press, 1991.
  • Moraga, C., “From a Long Line of Vendidas: Chicanas and Feminism” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Narayan, U., “Contesting Cultures: ‘Westernization,’ Respect for Cultures and Third-World Feminists,” in The Second Wave: A Reader in Feminist Theory, (ed.) Nicholson, L., New York:Routledge,1997.
  • Ngan Ling Chow, E., “The Development of Feminist Consciousness Among Asian American Women,” in The Social Construction of Gender, (eds.) Lorber, J. and Farrel, S. Sage Publications, 1991.
  • Scott, J., “The Evidence of Experience,” Critical Inquiry 17, 4 (Summer 1991)
  • Shehabuddin, E., “Gender and the Figure of the ‘Moderate Muslim’: Feminism in the Twenty-first Century,’ in Judith Butler and Elizabeth Weed, eds. The Question of Gender: Joan W. Scott's Critical Feminism (Indiana University Press, 2011).
  • Spelman, E., Inessential Woman: Problems of Exclusion in Feminist Thought, Beacon Press: Boston, 1988.
  • Srivastava, S., “You’re calling me a racist? The Moral and Emotional Regulation of Antiracism and Feminism," Signs the Journal of Women in Culture and Society, 2005, vol 31, no. 1  (30, 44, 42-43)
  • Stubblefield, A., “Meditations on Postsupremacist Philosophy” in White on White/Black on Black, G. Yancy (ed.), New York: Rowman &Littlefield, 2005.
  • Thomas, L., Moral Deference, 1998.
  • Truth, S., “Ain’t I A Woman? December 1851,” Internet Modern History Sourcebook, (ed.) Paul Halsal (March 2009).


Author Information

Sharin N. Elkholy
University of Houston – Downtown
U. S. A.

Care Ethics

The moral theory known as “ the ethics of care” implies that there is moral significance in the fundamental elements of relationships and dependencies in human life. Normatively, care ethics seeks to maintain relationships by contextualizing and promoting the well-being of care-givers and care-receivers in a network of social relations. Most often defined as a practice or virtue rather than a theory as such, "care" involves maintaining the world of, and meeting the needs of, ourself and others. It builds on the motivation to care for those who are dependent and vulnerable, and it is inspired by both memories of being cared for and the idealizations of self. Following in the sentimentalist tradition of moral theory, care ethics affirms the importance of caring motivation, emotion and the body in moral deliberation, as well as reasoning from particulars. One of the original works of care ethics was Milton Mayeroff’s short book, On Caring, but the emergence of care ethics as a distinct moral theory is most often attributed to the works of psychologist Carol Gilligan and philosopher Nel Noddings in the mid-1980s. Both charged traditional moral approaches with male bias, and asserted the “voice of care” as a legitimate alternative to the “justice perspective” of liberal human rights theory. Annette Baier, Virginia Held, Eva Feder Kittay, Sara Ruddick, and Joan Tronto are some of the most influential among many subsequent contributors to care ethics.

Typically contrasted with deontological/Kantian and consequentialist/utilitarian ethics, care ethics is found to have affinities with moral perspectives such as African ethics, Confucian ethics, and others. Critics fault care ethics with being a kind of slave morality, and as having serious shortcomings including essentialism, parochialism, and ambiguity. Although care ethics is not synonymous with feminist ethics, much has been written about care ethics as a feminine and feminist ethic, in relation to motherhood, international relations, and political theory. Care ethics is widely applied to a number of moral issues and ethical fields, including caring for animals and the environment, bioethics, and more recently public policy. Originally conceived as most appropriate to the private and intimate spheres of life, care ethics has branched out as a political theory and social movement aimed at broader understanding of, and public support for, care-giving activities in their breadth and variety.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Major Authors
    1. Carol Gilligan
    2. Nel Noddings
    3. Other Influential authors
      1. Annette Baier
      2. Virginia Held
      3. Eva Feder Kittay
      4. Sara Ruddick
      5. Joan Tronto
  2. Definitions of Care
  3. Criticisms
    1. Care Ethics as a Slave Morality
    2. Care Ethics as Empirically Flawed
    3. Care Ethics as Theoretically Indistinct
    4. Care Ethics as Parochial
    5. Care Ethics as Essentialist
    6. Care Ethics as Ambiguous
  4. Feminine and Feminist Ethics
  5. Relation to Other Theories
  6. Maternalism
  7. International Relations
  8. Political Theory
  9. Caring for Animals
  10. Applied Care Ethics
  11. Care Movements
  12. References and Further Reading

1. History and Major Authors

a. Carol Gilligan

While early strains of care ethics can be detected in the writings of feminist philosophers such as Mary Wollstonecraft, Catherine and Harriet Beecher, and Charlotte Perkins, it was first most explicitly articulated by Carol Gilligan and Nel Noddings in the early 1980s. While a graduate student at Harvard, Gilligan wrote her dissertation outlining a different path of moral development than the one described by Lawrence Kohlberg, her mentor. Kohlberg had posited that moral development progressively moves toward more universalized and principled thinking and had also found that girls, when later included in his studies, scored significantly lower than boys. Gilligan faulted Kohlberg’s model of moral development for being gender biased, and reported hearing a “different voice” than the voice of justice presumed in Kohlberg’s model. She found that both men and women articulated the voice of care at different times, but noted that the voice of care, without women, would nearly fall out of their studies. Refuting the charge that the moral reasoning of girls and women is immature because of its preoccupation with immediate relations, Gilligan asserted that the “care perspective” was an alternative, but equally legitimate form of moral reasoning obscured by masculine liberal justice traditions focused on autonomy and independence. She characterized this difference as one of theme, however, rather than of gender.

Gilligan articulated these thematic perspectives through the moral reasoning of “Jake” and “Amy”, two children in Kohlberg’s studies responding to the “Heinz dilemma”. In this dilemma, the children are asked whether a man, “Heinz”, should have stolen an overpriced drug to save the life of his ill wife. Jake sees the Heinz dilemma as a math problem with people wherein the right to life trumps the right to property, such that all people would reasonably judge that Heinz ought to steal the drug. Amy, on the other hand, disagrees that Heinz should steal the drug, lest he should go to prison and leave his wife in another predicament. She sees the dilemma as a narrative of relations over time, involving fractured relationships that must be mended through communication. Understanding the world as populated with networks of relationships rather than people standing alone, Amy is confident that the druggist would be willing to work with Heinz once the situation was explained. Gilligan posited that men and women often speak different languages that they think are the same, and she sought to correct the tendency to take the male perspective as the prototype for humanity in moral reasoning.

Later, Gilligan vigorously resisted readings of her work that posit care ethics as relating to gender more than theme, and even established the harmony of care and justice ethics (1986), but she never fully abandoned her thesis of an association between women and relational ethics. She further developed the idea of two distinct moral “voices”, and their relationship to gender in Mapping the Moral Domain:  A Contribution of Women’s Thinking to Psychological Theory and Education (Gilligan, Ward, and Taylor, 1988), a collection of essays that traced the predominance of the “justice perspective” within the fields of psychology and education, and the implications of the excluded “care perspective”. In Making Connections:  The Relational Worlds of Adolescent Girls at Emma Willard School, Gilligan and her co-editors argued that the time between the ages of eleven and sixteen is crucial to girls’ formation of identity, being the time when girls learn to silence their inner moral intuitions in favor of more rule bound interpretations of moral reasoning (Gilligan, Lyons, and Hamner, 1990, 3). Gilligan found that in adulthood women are encouraged to resolve the crises of adolescence by excluding themselves or others, that is, by being good/responsive, or by being selfish/independent. As a result, women’s adolescent voices of resistance become silent, and they experience a dislocation of self, mind, and body, which may be reflected in eating disorders, low leadership aspiration, and self-effacing sexual choices. Gilligan also expanded her ideas in a number of articles and reports (Gilligan, 1979; 1980; 1982; 1987).

b. Nel Noddings

In 1984 Noddings published Caring, in which she developed the idea of care as a feminine ethic, and applied it to the practice of moral education. Starting from the presumption that women “enter the practical domain of moral action…through a different door”, she ascribed to feminine ethics a preference for face-to face moral deliberation that occurs in real time, and appreciation of the uniqueness of each caring relationship. Drawing conceptually from a maternal perspective, Noddings understood caring relationships to be basic to human existence and consciousness. She identified two parties in a caring relationship—“one-caring” and the “cared-for”—and affirmed that both parties have some form of obligation to care reciprocally and meet the other morally, although not in the same manner. She characterized caring as an act of “engrossment” whereby the one-caring receives the cared-for on their own terms, resisting projection of the self onto the cared-for, and displacing selfish motives in order to act on the behalf of the cared-for. Noddings located the origin of ethical action in two motives, the human affective response that is a natural caring sentiment, and the memory of being cared-for that gives rise to an ideal self. Noddings rejected universal principles for prescribed action and judgment, arguing that care must always be contextually applied.

Noddings identified two stages of caring, “caring-for” and “caring-about”. The former stage refers to actual hands-on application of caring services, and the latter to a state of being whereby one nurtures caring ideas or intentions. She further argued that the scope of caring obligation is limited. This scope of caring is  strongest towards others who are capable of reciprocal relationship. The caring obligation is conceived of as moving outward in concentric circles so enlarged care is increasingly characterized by a diminished ability for particularity and contextual judgment, which prompted Noddings to speculate that it is impossible to care-for everyone. She maintained that while the one-caring has an obligation to care-for proximate humans and animals to the extent that they are needy and able to respond to offerings of care, there is a lesser obligation to care for distant others if there is no hope that care will be completed. These claims proved to be highly controversial, and Noddings later revised them somewhat. In her more recent book Starting From Home, Noddings endorsed a stronger obligation to care about distant humans, and affirms caring-about as an important motivational stage for inspiring local and global justice, but continued to hold that it is impossible to care-for all, especially distant others. (See 3a.iv below)

c. Other Influential authors

Although many philosophers have developed care ethics, five authors are especially notable.

i. Annette Baier

Annette Baier observes certain affinities between care ethics and the moral theory of David Hume, whom she dubs the “women’s moral theorist.” Baier suggests both deny that morality consists in obedience to a universal law, emphasizing rather the importance of cultivating virtuous sentimental character traits, including gentleness, agreeability, compassion, sympathy, and good temperedness (1987, 42). Baier specially underscores trust, a basic relation between particular persons, as the fundamental concept of morality, and notes its obfuscation within theories premised on abstract and autonomous agents. She recommends carving out room for the development of moral emotions and harmonizing the ideals of care and justice.

ii. Virginia Held

Virginia Held is the editor and author of many books pertaining to care ethics. In much of her work she seeks to move beyond ideals of liberal justice, arguing that they are not as much flawed as limited, and examines how social relations might be different when modeled after mothering persons and children. Premised on a fundamental non-contractual human need for care, Held construes care as the most basic moral value. In Feminist Morality (1993), Held explores the transformative power of creating new kinds of social persons, and the potentially distinct culture and politics of a society that sees as “its most important task the flourishing of children and the creation of human relationships”. She describes feminist ethics as committed to actual experience, with an emphasis on reason and emotion, literal rather than hypothetical persons, embodiment, actual dialogue, and contextual, lived methodologies. In The Ethics of Care (2006), Held demonstrates the relevance of care ethics to political, social and global questions. Conceptualizing care as a cluster of practices and values, she describes a caring person as one who has appropriate motivations to care for others and who participates adeptly in effective caring practices. She argues for limiting both market provisions for care and the need for legalistic thinking in ethics, asserting that care ethics has superior resources for dealing with the power and violence that imbues all relations, including those on the global level. Specifically, she recommends a view of a globally interdependent civil society increasingly dependent upon an array of caring NGOs for solving problems. She notes: “The small societies of family and friendship embedded in larger societies are formed by caring relations... A globalization of caring relations would help enable people of different states and cultures to live in peace, to respect each others’ rights, to care together for their environments, and to improve the lives of their children”(168). Ultimately, she argues that rights based moral theories presume a background of social connection, and that when fore-grounded, care ethics can help to create communities that promote healthy social relations, rather than the near boundless pursuit of self-interest.

iii. Eva Feder Kittay

Eva Feder Kittay is another prominent care ethicist. Her book, Women and Moral Theory (1987), co-edited with Diana T. Meyers, is one the most significant anthologies in care ethics to date. In  this work they map conceptual territory inspired by Gilligan's work, both critically and supportively, by exploring major philosophical themes such as self and autonomy, ethical principles and universality, feminist moral theory, and women and politics. In Love's Labor (1999), Kittay develops a dependency based account of equality rooted in the activity of caring for the seriously disabled. Kittay holds that the principles in egalitarian theories of justice, such as  those of John Rawls, depend upon more fundamental principles and practices of care, and that without supplementation such theories undermine themselves (108). Kittay observes that in practice some women have been able to leave behind traditional care-giving roles only because other women have filled them, but she resists the essentialist association between women and care by speaking of “dependency workers” and “dependency relations”. She argues that equality for dependency workers and the unavoidably dependent will only be achieved through conceptual and institutional reform. Employing expanded ideals of fairness and reciprocity that take interdependence as basic, Kittay poses a third principle for Rawls' theory of justice: “To each according to his or her need, from each to his or her capacity for care, and such support from social institutions as to make available resources and opportunities to those providing care” (113). She more precisely calls for the public provision of Doulas, paid professional care-workers who care for care-givers, and uses the principle of Doula to justify welfare for all care-givers, akin to worker's compensation or unemployment benefits.

iv. Sara Ruddick

Held identifies Sara Ruddick as the original pioneer of the theory of care ethics, citing Ruddick's 1980 article “Maternal Thinking” as the first articulation of a distinctly feminine approach to ethics. In this article, and in her later book of the same title (1989), Ruddick uses care ethical methodology to theorize from the lived experience of mothering, rendering a unique approach to moral reasoning and a ground for a feminist politics of peace. Ruddick explains how the practices of “maternal persons” (who may be men or women), exhibit cognitive capacities or conceptions of virtue with larger moral relevance. Ruddick's analysis, which forges strong associations between care ethics and motherhood, has been both well-received and controversial (see Section 6, below).

v. Joan Tronto

Joan Tronto is most known for exploring the intersections of care ethics, feminist theory, and political science. She sanctions a feminist care ethic designed to thwart the accretion of power to the existing powerful, and to increase value for activities that legitimize shared power. She identifies moral boundaries that have served to privatize the implications of care ethics, and highlights the political dynamics of care relations which describe, for example, the tendency of women and other minorities to perform care work in ways that benefit the social elite. She expands the phases of care to include “caring about”, “taking care of” (assuming responsibility for care), “care-giving” (the direct meeting of need), and “care-receiving”. She coins the phrase “privileged irresponsibility” to describe the phenomenon that allows the most advantaged in society to purchase caring services, delegate the work of care-giving, and avoid responsibility for the adequacy of hands-on care. (See Sections 2 and 8 below).

2. Definitions of Care

Because it depends upon contextual considerations, care is notoriously difficult to define. As Ruddick points out, at least three distinct but overlapping meanings of care have emerged in recent decades—an ethic defined in opposition to justice, a kind of labor, and a particular relationship (1998, 4). However, in care ethical literature, 'care' is most often defined as a practice, value, disposition, or virtue, and is frequently portrayed as an overlapping set of concepts. For example, Held notes that care is a form of labor, but also an ideal that guides normative judgment and action, and she characterizes care as “clusters” of practices and values (2006, 36, 40). One of the most popular definitions of care, offered by Tronto and Bernice Fischer, construes care as “a species of activity that includes everything we do to maintain, contain, and repair our 'world' so that we can live in it as well as possible. That world includes our bodies, ourselves, and our environment”. This definition posits care fundamentally as a practice, but Tronto further identifies four sub-elements of care that can be understood simultaneously as stages, virtuous dispositions, or goals. These sub-elements are: (1) attentiveness, a proclivity to become aware of need; (2) responsibility, a willingness to respond and take care of need; (3) competence, the skill of providing good and successful care; and (4) responsiveness, consideration of the position of others as they see it and recognition of the potential for abuse in care (1994, 126-136). Tronto's definition is praised for how it admits to cultural variation and extends care beyond family and domestic spheres, but it is also criticized for being overly broad, counting nearly every human activity as care.

Other definitions of care provide more precise delineations. Diemut Bubeck narrows the definitional scope of care by emphasizing personal interaction and dependency. She describes care as an emotional state, activity, or both, that is functional, and specifically involves “the meeting of needs of one person by another where face-to-face interaction between care and cared for is a crucial element of overall activity, and where the need is of such a nature that it cannot possibly be met by the person in need herself” (129). Bubeck thus distinguishes care from “service”, by stipulating that “care” involves meeting the needs for others who cannot meet their needs themselves, whereas “service” involves meeting the needs of individuals who are capable of self-care. She also holds that one cannot care for oneself, and that care does not require any emotional attachment. While some care ethicists accept that care need not always have an emotional component, Bubeck's definitional exclusion of self-care is rejected by other care ethicists who stress additional aspects of care.

For example, both Maurice Hamington and Daniel Engster make room for self-care in their definitions of care, but focus more precisely on special bodily features and end goals of care (Hamington, 2004; Engster, 2007). Hamington focuses on embodiment, stating that: “care denotes an approach to personal and social morality that shifts ethical considerations to context, relationships, and affective knowledge in a manner that can only be fully understood if care's embodied dimension is recognized. Care is committed to flourishing and growth of individuals, yet acknowledges our interconnectedness and interdependence” (2004, 3). Engster develops a “basic needs” approach to care, defining care as a practice that includes “everything we do to help individuals to meet their vital biological needs, develop or maintain their basic capabilities, and avoid or alleviate unnecessary or unwanted pain and suffering, so that they can survive, develop, and function in society” (2007, 28). Although care is often unpaid, interpersonal, and emotional work, Engster’s definition does not exclude paid work or self-care, nor require the presence of affection or other emotion (32). Although these definitions emphasize care as a practice, not all moral theorists maintain this view of.

Alternatively, care is understood as a virtue or motive. James Rachels, Raja Halwani, and Margaret McLaren have argued for categorizing care ethics as a species of virtue ethics, with care as a central virtue (Rachels, 1999; McLaren, 2001; Halwani, 2003). The idea that that care is best understood as virtuous motives or communicative skills is endorsed by Michael Slote who equates care with a kind of motivational attitude of empathy, and by Selma Sevenhuijsen, who defines care as “styles of situated moral reasoning” that involves listening and responding to others on their own terms.” (Slote, 2007; Sevenhuijsen, 1998, 85).

Some ethicists prefer to understand care as a practice more fundamental than a virtue or motive because doing so resists the tendency to romanticize care as a sentiment or dispositional trait, and reveals the breadth of caring activities as globally intertwined with virtually all aspects of life. As feminist ethicists, Kittay and Held like to understand care as a practice and value rather than as a virtue because it risks “losing site of it as work” (Held, 2006, 35). Held refutes that care is best understood as a disposition such as compassion or benevolence, but defines “care” as “more a characterization of a social relation than the description of an individual disposition.”

Overall, care continues to be an essentially contested concept, containing ambiguities that Peta Bowden, finds advantageous, revealing  “the complexity and diversity of the ethical possibilities of care”(1997, 183).

3. Criticisms

A number of criticisms have been launched against care ethics, including that it is: a) a slave morality; b) empirically flawed; c) theoretically indistinct; d) parochial, e) essentialist, and f) ambiguous.

a. Care Ethics as a Slave Morality

One of the earliest objections was that care ethics is a kind of slave morality valorizing the oppression of women (Puka, 1990; Card, 1990; Davion, 1993). The concept of slave morality comes from the philosopher Frederick Nietzsche, who held that oppressed peoples tend to develop moral theories that reaffirm subservient traits as virtues. Following this tradition, the charge that care ethics is a slave morality interprets the different voice of care as emerging from patriarchal traditions characterized by rigidly enforced sexual divisions of labor. This critique issues caution against uncritically valorizing caring practices and inclinations because women who predominantly perform the work of care often do so to their own economic and political disadvantage. To the extent that care ethics encourages care without further inquiring as to who is caring for whom, and whether these relationships are just, it provides an unsatisfactory base for a fully libratory ethic. This objection further implies that the voice of care may not be an authentic or empowering expression, but a product of false consciousness that equates moral maturity with self-sacrifice and self-effacement.

b. Care Ethics as Empirically Flawed

Critics also question the empirical accuracy and validity of Gilligan’s studies. Gilligan has been faulted for basing her conclusions on too narrow a sample, and for drawing from overly homogenous groups such as students at elite colleges and women considering abortion (thereby excluding women who would not view abortion as morally permissible). It is argued that wider samples yield more diverse results and complicate  the picture of dual and gendered moral perspectives (Haan, 1976; Brabeck, 1983). For instance, Vanessa Siddle Walker and John Snarey surmise that resolution of the Heinz dilemma shifts if Heinz is identified as Black, because in the United States African-American males are disproportionately likely to be arrested for crime, and less likely to have their cases dismissed without stringent penalties (Walker and Snarey, 2004). Sandra Harding observes certain similarities between care ethics and African moralities, noting that care ethics has affinities with many other moral traditions (Harding, 1987). Sarah Lucia Hoagland identifies care as the heart of lesbian connection, but also cautions against the dangers of assuming that all care relations are ideally maternalistic (Hoagland, 1988). Thus, even if some women identify with care ethics, it is unclear whether this is a general quality of women, whether moral development is distinctly and dualistically gendered, and whether the voice of care is the only alternative moral voice. However, authors like Marilyn Friedman maintain that even if it cannot be shown that care is a distinctly female moral orientation, it is plausibly understood as a symbolically feminine approach (Friedman, 1987).

c. Care Ethics as Theoretically Indistinct

Along similar lines some critics object that care ethics is not a highly distinct moral theory, and that it rightly incorporates liberal concepts such as autonomy, equality, and justice. Some defenders of utilitarianism and deontology argue that the concerns highlighted by care ethics have been, or could be, readily addressed by existing theories (Nagl-Docekal, 1997; Ma, 2002). Others suggest that care ethics merely reduces to virtue ethics with care being one of many virtues (Rachels, 1999; Slote, 1998a; 1998b; McLaren, 2001, Halwani, 2003). Although a number of care ethicists explore the possible overlap between care ethics and other moral theories, the distinctiveness of the ethic is defended by some current advocates of care ethics, who contend that the focus on social power, identity, relationship, and interdependency are unique aspects of the theory (Sander-Staudt, 2006). Most care ethicists make room for justice concerns and for critically scrutinizing alternatives amongst justice perspectives. In some cases, care ethicists understand the perspectives of care and justice as mutual supplements to one another. Other theorists underscore the strategic potential for construing care as a right in liberal societies that place a high rhetorical value on human rights. Yet others explore the benefits of integrating care ethics with less liberal traditions of justice, such as Marxism (Bubeck, 1995).

d. Care Ethics as Parochial

Another set of criticisms center around the concern that care ethics obscures larger social dynamics and is overly parochial. These critiques aim at Noddings’ original assertion that care givers have primary obligations to proximate others over distant others (Tronto, 1995, 111-112; Robinson, 1999, 31). Critics worry that this stance privileges elite care-givers by excusing them from attending to significant differences in international standards of living and their causes. Critics also express a concern that without a broader sense of justice, care ethics may allow for cronyism and favoritism toward one’s family and friends (Friedman, 2006; Tronto, 2006). Noddings now affirms an explicit theme of justice in care ethics that resists arbitrary favoritism, and that extends to public and international domains. Yet she upholds the primacy of the domestic sphere as the originator and nurturer of justice, in the sense that the best social policies are identified, modeled, and sustained by practices in the “best families”. Other care ethicists refine Noddings' claim by emphasizing the practical and moral connections between proximate and distant relations, by affirming a principle of care for the most vulnerable on a global level, and by explicitly weaving a political component into care theory.

e. Care Ethics as Essentialist

The objection that care ethics is essentialist stems from the more general essentialist critique made by Elizabeth Spelman (1988). Following this argument, early versions of care ethics have been faulted for failing to explore the ways in which women (and others) differ from one another, and for thereby offering a uniform picture of moral development that reinforces sex stereotypes (Tronto, 1994). Critics challenge tendencies in care ethics to theorize care based on a dyadic model of a (care-giving) mother and a (care-receiving) child, on the grounds that it overly romanticizes motherhood and does not adequately represent the vast experiences of individuals (Hoagland, 1991). The charge of essentialism in care ethics highlights ways in which women and men are differently implicated in chains of care depending on variables of class, race, age, and more. Essentialism in care ethics is problematic not only because it is conceptually facile, but also because of its political implications for social justice. For example, in the United States women of color and white women are differently situated in terms of who is more likely to give and receive care, and of what degree and quality, because the least paid care workers predominantly continue to be women of color. Likewise, lesbian and heterosexual women are differently situated in being able to claim the benefits and burdens of marriage, and are not equally presumed to be fit as care-givers. Contemporary feminist care ethicists attempt to avoid essentialism by employing several strategies, including: more thoroughly illuminating the practices of care on multiple levels and from various perspectives; situating caring practices in place and time; construing care as the symbolic rather than actual voice of women; exploring the potential of care as a gender neutral activity; and being consistently mindful of perspective and privilege in the activity of moral theorizing.

f. Care Ethics as Ambiguous

Because it eschews abstract principles and decisional procedures, care ethics is often accused of being unduly ambiguous, and for failing to offer concrete guidance for ethical action (Rachels, 1999). Some care ethicists find the non-principled nature of care ethics to be overstated, noting that because a care perspective may eschew some principles does not mean that it eschews all principles entirely (Held, 1995). Principles that could be regarded as central to care ethics might pertain to the origin and basic need of care relations, the evaluation of claims of need, the obligation to care, and the scope of care distribution. On principle, it would seem, a care ethic guides the moral agent to recognize relational interdependency, care for the self and others, cultivate the skills of attention, response, respect, and completion, and maintain just and caring relationships. However, while theorists define care ethics as a theory derived from actual practices, they simultaneously resist subjectivism and moral relativism.

4. Feminine and Feminist Ethics

Because of its association with women, care ethics is often construed as a feminine ethic. Indeed, care ethics, feminine ethics, and feminist ethics are often treated as synonymous. But although they overlap, these are discrete fields in that although care ethics connotes feminine traits, not all feminine and feminist ethics are care ethics, and the necessary connection between care ethics and femininity has been subject to rigorous challenge. The idea that there may be a distinctly woman-oriented, or a feminine approach to ethics, can be traced far back in history. Attempts to legitimate this approach gained momentum in the 18th and 19th centuries, fueled by some suffragettes, who argued that granting voting rights to (white) women would lead to moral social improvements. Central assumptions of feminine ethics are that women are similar enough to share a common perspective, rooted in the biological capacity and expectation of motherhood, and that characteristically feminine traits include compassion, empathy, nurturance, and kindness.

But once it is acknowledged that women are diverse, and that some men exhibit equally strong tendencies to care, it is not readily apparent that care ethics is solely or uniquely feminine. Many women, in actuality and in myth, in both contemporary and past times, do not exhibit care. Other factors of social identity, such as ethnicity and class, have also been found to correlate with care thinking. Nonetheless, care has pervasively been assumed to be a symbolically feminine trait and perspective, and many women resonate with a care perspective. What differentiates feminine and feminist care ethics turns on the extent to which there is critical inquiry into the empirical and symbolic association between women and care, and concern for the power-related implications of this association. Alison Jaggar characterizes a feminist ethic as one which exposes masculine and other biases in moral theory, understands individual actions in the context of social practices, illuminates differences between women, provides guidance for private, public, and international issues, and treats the experiences of women respectfully, but not uncritically (Jaggar, 1991).

While most theorists agree that it is mistaken to view care ethics as a “woman's morality”, the best way to understand its relation to sex and gender is disputed. Slote develops a strictly gender neutral theory of care on the grounds that care ethics can be traced to the work of male as well as female philosophers. Engster endorses a “minimally feminist theory of care” that is largely gender neutral because he defines care as meeting needs that are more generally human. Although he acknowledges that women are disadvantaged in current caring distributions and are often socialized to value self-effacing care, his theory is feminist only in seeking to assure that the basic needs of women and girls are met and their capabilities developed.

In contrast, Held, Kittay, and Tronto draft more robust overlaps between care and feminist theory, retaining yet challenging the gender-laden associations of care with language like “mothering persons” or “dependency workers”. While cautious of the associations between care and femininity, they find it useful to tap the resources of the lived and embodied experiences of women, a common one which is the capacity to birth children. They tend to define care as a practice partially in order to stay mindful of the ongoing empirical (if misguided) associations between care and women, that must inform utopian visions of care as a gender-neutral activity and virtue. Complicating things further, individuals who are sexed as women may nonetheless gain social privilege when they exhibit certain perceived traits of the male gender, such as being unencumbered and competitive, suggesting that it is potentially as important to revalue feminine traits and activities, as it is to stress the gender-neutral potential of care ethics.

As it currently stands, care ethicists agree that women are positioned differently than men in relation to caring practices, but there is no clear consensus about the best way to theorize sex and gender in care ethics.

5. Relation to Other Theories

Care ethics originally developed as an alternative to the moral theories of Kantian deontology and Utilitarianism consequentialism, but it is thought to have affinities with numerous other moral theories, such as African ethics, David Hume’s sentimentalism, Aristotelian virtue ethics, the phenomenology of Merleau-Ponty, Levinasian ethics, and Confucianism. The most pre-dominant of these comparisons has been between care ethics and virtue ethics, to the extent that care ethics is sometimes categorized as a form of virtue ethics, with care being a central virtue. The identification of caring virtues fuels the tendency to classify care ethics as a virtue ethic, although this system of classification is not universally endorsed.

Some theorists move to integrate care and virtue ethics for strategic reasons. Slote seeks to form an alliance against traditional “masculine” moral theories like Kantianism, utilitarianism, and social contract theory (Slote, 1998). He argues that, in so doing, care ethics receives a way of treating our obligations to people we don’t know, without having to supplement it with more problematic theories of justice. McLaren posits that virtue theory provides a normative framework which care ethics lacks (McLaren, 2001). The perceived flaw in care ethics for both authors is a neglect of justice standards in how care is distributed and practiced, and a relegation of care to the private realm, which exacerbates the isolation and individualization of the burdens of care already prevalent in liberal societies. McLaren contends that virtue theory provides care ethics both with a standard of appropriateness and a normative framework: “The standard of appropriateness is the mean—a virtue is always the mean between two extremes…The normative framework stems from the definition of virtue as that which promotes human flourishing” (2001, 105). Feminist critics, however, resist this assimilation on the grounds that it may dilute the unique focus of care ethics (Held, 2006; Sander-Staudt, 2006). They are optimistic that feminist versions of care ethics can address the above concerns of justice, and doubt that virtue ethics provides the best normative framework.

Similar debates surround the comparison between care ethics and Confucianism. Philosophers note a number of similarities between care ethics and Confucian ethics, not least that both theories are often characterized as virtue ethics (Li, 1994, 2000; Lai Tao, 2000). Additional similarities are that both theories emphasize relationship as fundamental to being, eschew general principles, highlight the parent-child relation as paramount, view moral responses as properly graduated, and identify emotions such as empathy, compassion, and sensitivity as prerequisites for moral response. The most common comparison is between the concepts of care and the Confucian concept of jen/ren. Ren is often translated as love of humanity, or enlargement. Several authors argue that there is enough overlap between the concepts of care and ren to judge that care ethics and Confucian ethics are remarkably similar and compatible systems of thought (Li, 1994; Rosemont, 1997).

However, some philosophers object that it is better to view care ethics as distinct from Confucian ethics, because of their potentially incompatible aspects. Feminist care ethicists charge that a feminist care ethic is not compatible with the way Confucianism subordinates women. Ranjoo Seodu Herr locates the incompatibility as between the Confucian significance of li, or formal standards of ritual, and a feminist care ethics’ resistance to subjugation (2003). For similar reasons, Lijun Yuan doubts that Confucian ethics can ever be acceptable to contemporary feminists, despite its similarity to care ethics. Daniel Star categorizes Confucian ethics as a virtue ethic, and distinguishes virtue ethics and care ethics as involving different biases in moral perception (2002). According to Star, care ethics differs from Confucian ethics in not needing to be bound with any particular tradition, in downgrading the importance of principles (versus merely noting that principles may be revised or suspended), and in rejecting hierarchical, role-based categories of relationship in favor of contextual and particular responses.

There are also refutations of the belief that care ethics is conceptually incompatible with the justice perspectives of Kantian deontology and liberal human rights theory. Care ethicists dispute the inference that because care and justice have evolved as distinct practices and ideals, that they are incompatible. Some deny that Kantianism is as staunchly principled and rationalistic as often portrayed, and affirm that care ethics is compatible with Kantian deontology because it relies upon a universal injunction to care, and requires a principle of caring obligation. An adaptation of the Kantian categorical imperative can be used to ground the obligation to care in the universal necessity of care, and the inconsistency of willing a world without intent to care. Other theorists compare the compatibility between care ethics and concepts of central importance to a Kantian liberal tradition. Thus, Grace Clement argues that an ideal of individual autonomy is required by normative ideals of care, in the sense that care-givers ideally consent to and retain some degree of autonomy in caring relations, and also ideally foster the autonomy of care-receivers (Clement, 1996). Mona Harrington explores the significance of the liberal ideal of equality to care ethics by tracing how women’s inequality is linked to the low social valuing and provision of care work (Harrington, 2000). Other ways that Kantianism is thought to benefit care ethics is by serving as a supplementary check to caring practice, (denouncing caring relations that use others as mere means), and by providing a rhetorical vehicle for establishing care as a right.

6. Maternalism

As a theory rooted in practices of care, care ethics emerged in large part from analyses of the reasoning and activities associated with mothering. Although some critics caution against the tendency to construe all care relations in terms of a mother-child dyad, Ruddick and Held use a maternal perspective to expand care ethics as a moral and political theory. In particular, Ruddick argues that “maternal practice” yields specific kinds of thinking and supports a principled resistance to violence. Ruddick notes that while some mothers support violence and war, they should not because of how it threatens the goals and substance of care. Defining a mother as “a person who takes responsibility for children’s lives and for whom providing child care is a significant part of his or her working life”, Ruddick stipulates that both men and women can be mothers (40). She identifies the following metaphysical attitudes, cognitive capacities, and virtues associated with mothering: preservative love (work of protection with cheerfulness and humility), fostering growth (sponsoring or nurturing a child’s unfolding), and training for social acceptability (a process of socialization that requires conscience and a struggle for authenticity). Because children are subject to, but defy social expectations, the powers of mothers are limited by the “gaze of the others”. Loving attention helps mothers to perceive their children and themselves honestly so as to foster growth without retreating to fantasy or incurring loss of the self.

Expanding on the significance of the bodily experience of pregnancy and birth, Ruddick reasons that mothers should oppose a sharp division between masculinity and femininity as untrue to children’s sexual identities. In so doing, mothers should challenge the rigid division of male and female aspects characteristic of military ideology because it threatens the hope and promise of birth. Ruddick creates a feminist account of maternal care ethics that is rooted in the vulnerability, promise, and power of human bodies, and that by resisting cheery denial, can transform the symbols of motherhood into political speech.

But however useful the paradigm for mothering has been to care ethics, many find it to be a limited and problematic framework. Some critics reject Ruddick’s suggestion that mothering is logically peaceful, noting that mothering may demand violent protectiveness and fierce response. Although Ruddick acknowledges that many mothers support military endeavors and undermine peace movements, some critics are unconvinced that warfare is always illogical and universally contrary to maternal practice. Despite Ruddick's recognition of violence in mothering, others object that a motherhood paradigm offers a too narrowly dyadic and romantic paradigm, and that this approach mistakenly implies that characteristics of a mother-child relationship are universal worldly qualities of relationship. For these reasons, some care ethicists, even when in agreement over the significance of the mother-child relationship, have sought to expand the scope of care ethics by exploring other paradigms of care work, such as friendship and citizenship.

7. International Relations

Care ethics was initially viewed as having little to say about international relations. With an emphasis on known persons and particular selves, care ethics did not seem to be a moral theory suited to guide relations with distant or hostile others. Fiona Robinson challenges this idea, however, by developing a critical ethics of care that attends to the relations of dependency and vulnerability that exist on a global scale (Robinson, 1999). Robinson’s analysis expands the sentiment of care to address the inequalities within current international relations by promoting a care ethic that is responsive and attentive to the difference of others, without presuming universal homogeneity. She argues that universal principles of right and wrong typically fail to generate moral responses that alleviate the suffering of real people. But she is optimistic that a feminist phenomenological version of care ethics can do so by exploring the actual nature, conditions, and possibilities of global relations. She finds that the preoccupation with the nation state in cosmopolitanism and communitarianism, and the enforced global primacy of liberal values such as autonomy, independence, self-determination, and others, has led to a ‘culture of neglect’. This culture is girded by a systemic devaluing of interdependence, relatedness, and positive interaction with distant others. A critical ethic of care understands the global order not as emerging from a unified or homogeneous humanity, but from structures that exploit differences to exclude, marginalize and dominate. While Robinson doubts the possibility of “a more caring world” where poverty and suffering are entirely eliminated, she finds that a critical care ethic may offer an alternative mode of response that can motivate global care.

Likewise, Held is hopeful that care ethics can be used to transform international relations between states, by noticing cultural constructs of masculinity in state behaviors, and by calling for cooperative values to replace hierarchy and domination based on gender, class, race and ethnicity (Held, 2006). Care ethicists continue to explore how care ethics can be applied to international relations in the context of the global need for care and in the international supply and demand for care that is served by migrant populations of women.

8. Political Theory

As a political theory, care ethics examines questions of social justice, including the distribution of social benefits and burdens, legislation, governance, and claims of entitlement. One of the earliest explorations of the implications of care ethics for feminist political theory was in Seyla Behabib’s article “The Generalized and the Concrete Other:  The Kohlberg-Gilligan Controversy and Feminist Theory” (Benhabib, 1986). Here, Benhabib traces a basic dichotomy in political and moral theory drawn between the public and private realms. Whereas the former is thought to be the realm of justice, the social and historical, and generalized others, the latter is thought to be the realm of the good life, the natural and atemporal, and concrete others. The former is captured by the favored metaphor of social contract theory and the “state of nature”, wherein men roam as adults, alone, independent, and free from the ties of birth by women. Benhabib traces this metaphor, internalized by the male ego, within the political philosophies of Thomas Hobbes, John Locke, and John Rawls, and the moral theories of Immanuel Kant and Lawrence Kohlberg. She argues that under this conception, human interdependency, difference, and questions about private life become irrelevant to politics.

The earliest substantial account of care as a political philosophy is offered by Tronto, who identifies the traditional boundary between ethics and politics as one of three boundaries  which serves to stymie the political efficacy of a woman’s care ethic, (the other two being the boundary between the particular and abstract/impersonal moral observer, and the boundary between public and private life) (Tronto, 1993). Together, these boundaries obscure how care as a political concept illuminates the interdependency of human beings, and how care could stimulate democratic and pluralistic politics in the United States by extending a platform to the politically disenfranchised. Following Tronto, a number of feminist care ethicists explore the implications of care ethics for a variety of political concepts, including Bubeck who adapts Marxist arguments to establish the social necessity and current exploitation of the work of care; Sevenhuijsen who reformulates citizenship to be more inclusive of caring need and care work; and Kittay who develops a dependency based concept of equality (Bubeck, 1995; Sevenhuijsen, 1998; Kittay, 1999). Other authors examine the relevance of care ethics to the political issues of welfare policy, restorative justice, political agency, and global business.

The most comprehensive articulation of care ethics as a political theory is given by Engster, who defends a need based account of moral obligation (Engster, 2007). Engster’s “minimal capability theory” is formed around two major premises—that all human beings are dependent upon others to develop their basic capabilities, and that in receiving care, individuals tacitly and logically become obliged to care for others. Engster understands care as a set of practices normatively informed by three virtues: attention, responsiveness, and respect. Defining care as everything we do to satisfy vital biological needs, develop and sustain basic capabilities, and avoid unnecessary suffering, Engster applies these goals to domestic politics, economic justice, international relations, and culture. Engster holds governments and businesses responsible for offering economic provisions in times of sickness, disability, frail old age, bad luck, and reversal of fortune, for providing protection, health care, and clean environments, and for upholding the basic rights of individuals. He calls for businesses to balance caring and commodity production by making work and care more compatible, although he surmises that the goals of care need not fully subordinate economic ends such as profitability.

According to Engster, care as a political theory has universal application because conditions of dependency are ubiquitous, but care need not be practiced by all groups in the same way, and has no necessary affinities with any particular political system, including Marxism and liberalism. Governments ought to primarily care for their own populations, but should also help the citizens of other nations living under abusive or neglectful regimes, within reasonable limits. International humanitarian interventions are more obligatory than military given the risk of physical harm, and the virtues of care can help the international community avoid dangers associated with humanitarian assistance. With specific reference to cultural practices in the U.S., Engster recommends a number of policy changes to education, employment, and the media.

9. Caring for Animals

While Gilligan was relatively silent about the moral status of animals in care ethics, Noddings made it clear that humans have moral obligations only to animals which are proximate, open to caring completion, and capable of reciprocity. On these grounds she surmises that while the one-caring has a moral obligation to care for a stray cat that shows up at the door and to safely transport spiders out of the house, one is under no obligation to care for a stray rat or to become a vegetarian. She further rejects Peter Singer’s claim that it is specieist to favor humans over animals. Other care ethicists, however, such as Rita Manning, point out differences in our obligations to care for companion, domesticated, and wild animals based upon “carefully listening to the creatures who are with you in [a] concrete situation” (Manning, 1992; 1996).

The application of care ethics to the moral status of animals has been most thoroughly explored by Carol Adams and Josephine Donovan (Adams and Donovan 1996; 2007). Expanding on Adams’ original analysis of the sexual politics of meat (Adams, 1990), they maintain that a feminist care tradition offers a superior foundation for animal ethics. They specifically question whether rights theory is an adequate framework for an animal defense ethic because of its rationalist roots and individualist ontology, its tendency to extend rights to animals based on human traits, its devaluing of emotion and the body, and its preference for abstract, formal, and quantifiable rules. Alternatively, they argue that a feminist care ethic is a preferable foundation for grounding moral obligations to animals because its relational ontology acknowledges love and empathy as major bases for human-animal connections, and its contextual flexibility allows for a more nuanced consideration of animals across a continuum of difference.

Engster similarly argues that the human obligation to care for non-human animals is limited by the degree to which non-human animals are dependent upon humans (Engster, 2006). Because an obligation to care is rooted in dependency, humans do not have moral obligations to care for animals that are not dependent upon humans. However, an obligation to care for animals is established when humans make them dependent by providing food or shelter. Engster surmises that neither veganism nor vegetarianism are required providing that animals live happy, mature lives, and are humanely slaughtered, but also acknowledges that the vast majority of animals live under atrocious conditions that care ethics renounces.

Empirical studies suggest interesting differences between the way that men and women think about the moral status of animals, most notably, that women are more strongly opposed to animal research and meat eating, and report being more willing to sacrifice for these causes, than men (Eldridge and Gluck, 1996). While feminist care ethicists are careful not to take such empirical correlations as an automatic endorsement of these views, eco-feminists like Marti Kheel explicate the connection between feminism, animal advocacy, environmental ethics, and holistic health movements (Kheel, 2008). Developing a more stringent obligation to care for animals, Kheel posits the uniqueness of all animals, and broadens the scope of the moral obligation of care to include all individual beings as well as larger collectives, noting that the majority of philosophies addressing animal welfare adopt masculine approaches founded on abstract rules, rational principles, and generalized perspectives.

10. Applied Care Ethics

In addition to the above topics, care ethics has been applied to a number of timely ethical debates, including reproductive technology, homosexuality and gay marriage, capital punishment, political agency, hospice care, and HIV treatment, as well as aspects of popular culture, such as the music of U-2 and The Sopranos. It increasingly informs moral analysis of the professions, such as education, medicine, nursing, and business, spurring new topics and modes of inquiry. It is used to provide moral assessment in other ethical fields, such as bioethics, business ethics, and environmental ethics. Perhaps because medicine is a profession that explicitly involves care for others, care ethics was quickly adopted in bioethics as a means for assessing relational and embodied aspects of medical practices and policies. As well as abortion, both Susan Sherwin and Rosemary Tong consider how feminist ethics, including an ethic of care, provides new insights into contraception and sterilization, artificial insemination and in vitro fertilization, surrogacy, and gene therapy. Care ethics is also applied by other authors to organ transplantation, the care of high risk patients, artificial womb technologies, advanced directives, and the ideal relationships between medical practitioners and patients.

11. Care Movements

There are a rising number of social movements organized around the concerns highlighted in care ethics. In 2000, Deborah Stone called for a national care movement in the U.S. to draw attention to the need for social programs of care such as universal health care, pre-school education, care for the elderly, improved foster care, and adequate wages for care-givers. In 2006, Hamington and Dorothy Miller compiled a number of essays concerning the theoretical understanding and application of care ethics to public life, including issues of welfare, same-sex marriage, restorative justice, corporate globalization, and the 21st century mother’s movement (Hamington and Miller, 2006). A number of formal political organizations of care exist, most of them on the internet, which variously center around themes of motherhood, fatherhood, health care, care as a profession, infant welfare, the woman’s movement, gay and lesbian rights, disability, and elder care. These organizations work to disseminate information, organize care advocates on key social issues, and form voting blocks. Of those focused around mothering, one of the most prominent is, organized by Joan Blades, one of the original founders of, and Kristin Rowe-Finkbeiner. Others include: The Mothers Movement Online,  Mothers Ought to Have Equal Rights, the National Association of Mothers' Centers, and Mothers and More. Judith Stadtman Tucker notes that problems with some mother’s movements include an overly exclusive focus on the interests of white, middle class care-givers, and an occasional lack of serious-mindedness, but she is also hopeful that care movements organized around motherhood can forge cultural transitions, including shorter work weeks, universal health care unhitched from employment, care leave policies, and increased levels of care work performed by men and states (Tucker, 2001).

12. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Carol. The Sexual Politics of Meat. New York:  Continuum, 1990.
  • Adams, C. and Donovan, J. Beyond Animal Rights:  A feminist Caring Ethic for the Treatment of Animals. New York:  Continuum, 1996.
  • Adams, C. and Donovan, J. The Feminist Care Tradition in Animal Ethics. New York:  Columbia University Press, 2007.
  • Baier, Annette. "Hume: The Woman's Moral Theorist?" in Women and Moral Theory, Kittay, Eva Feder, and Meyers, Diana (ed.s). U.S.A.: Rowman & Littlefield, 1987.
  • Baier, Annette. Moral Prejudices: Essays on Ethics. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • Benhabib, Seyla. “The Generalized and Concrete Other:  The Kohlberg-Gilligan Controversy and Moral Theory”, in Praxis International (1986) 38-60.
  • Blades, Joan and Rowe-Finkbeiner, Kristin. The Motherhood Manifesto: What America’s Moms Want and What to do about It. New York, NY: Nation Books, 2006.
  • Bowden, Peta. "An 'Ethics of Care' in Clinical Settings: Encompassing 'Feminine" and "Feminist" Perspectives." Nursing Philosophy 1.1 (2001): 36-49.
  • Bowden, Peta. Caring: Gender Sensitive Ethics. New York, NY: Routledge, 1997.
  • Brabeck, Mary. “Moral Judgment:  Theory and Research on Differences between males and Females” Developmental Review 3 (1983) 274-91.
  • Bubeck, Diemut. Care, Gender and Justice. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995.
  • Card, Claudia. “Caring and Evil.” Hypatia 5.1 (1990) 101-8.
  • Clement, Grace. Care, Autonomy and Justice: Feminism and the Ethic of Care. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1996.
  • Davion, Victoria. “Autonomy, Integrity, and Care” Social Theory and Practice 19.2 (1993) 161-82.
  • Donovan, Josephine and Adams, Carol, ed. Beyond Animal Rights: A Feminist Caring Ethic for the Treatment of Animals. New York, NY: Continuum Press, 1996.
  • Engster, Daniel. "Care ethics and Animal Welfare." Journal of Social Philosophy 37.4 (2006): 521.
  • Engster, Daniel. The Heart of Justice. Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 2007.
  • Friedman, Marilyn. “Beyond Caring:  The De-Moralization of Gender” in V. Held, Justice and Care:  Essential Readings in Feminist Ethics Boulder, CO:  Westview Press (2006): 61-77.
  • Fry, Sara T. "The Role of Caring in a Theory of Nursing Ethics." Hypatia 4.2. (1989): 88-101.
  • Gilligan, Carol. “Women’s Place in Man’s Life Cycle.” Harvard Educational Review, 29. (1979).
  • Gilligan, C. In A Different Voice. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1982.
  • Gilligan, C. “Adult Development and Women’s Development:  Arrangements for a Marriage” in J. Giele, ed. Women in the Middle Years. New York:  Wiley-Interscience Publications, John Wiley and Sons (1982).
  • Gilligan, C. “Reply” (to critics). Signs 11.2. (1986): 324-333.
  • Gilligan, C. and Belenky, M. “A Naturalist Study of Abortion Decisions.” In R. Selman and R. Yando (ed.s) New Directions in Child Development:  Clinical-Developmental Psychology. 7. San-Francisco, CA:  Jossey-Bass. (1980): 69-90.
  • Gilligan, C. Langdale, S. Lyons, N. & Murphy, J. The Contribution of Women’s Thought to Developmental Theory:  The Elimination of Sex Bias in Moral Developmental research and Education. Final Report to the National Institute of Education. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1982.
  • Gilligan, C. and Wiggins, G. “The Origins of Morality in Early Childhood Relationships”  in J. Kaggan and S. Lamb (ed.s) The Emergence of Morality in Early Childhood. Chicago:  University of Chicago Press (1987).
  • Gilligan, Ward, Taylor, and Bardige. Mapping the Moral Domain:  A Contribution of Women’s Thinking to Psychological Theory and Education. Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1988.
  • Gilligan, Lyons, and Hammer. Making Connections:  The Relational Worlds of Adolescent Girls at Emma Willard School. Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1990.
  • Haan, N. et al. “family Moral Patterns” Child Development 47.7 (1976) 1204-06.
  • Halwani, Raja. Virtuous Liaisons:  Care, Love, Sex, and Virtue Ethics. Peru, IL:  Open Court, 2003.
  • Hamington, Maurice. Embodied Care: Jane Addams, Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Feminist Ethics. Chicago, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004.
  • Hamington, Maurice and Miller, Dorothy, ed. Socializing Care. New York: NY: Rowman & Littlefield, 2006.
  • Hanen, Marsha and Nelson, Kai, ed.s. Science, Morality, and Feminist Theory. Calgary: University of Calgary Press, 1987.
  • Harding, Sandra. "The Curious Coincidence of Feminine and African Moralities." In Women and Moral Theory. Ed. Kittay, Eva Feder and Meyers, Diane. U.S.A: Rowman & Littlefield, 1989. 296-317.
  • Harrington, Mona. Care and Equality: Inventing a New Family Politics. New York, NY: Routledge, 2000.
  • Held, Virginia. Feminist Morality: Transforming Culture, Society, and Politics. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press, 1993.
  • Held, Virginia. “Feminist Moral Inquiry and the Feminist Future” in V. Held (ed.) Justice and Care. Boulder, Co:  Westview Press, 2006:  153-176.
  • Held, Virginia. The Ethics of Care. New York, NY: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Herr, Ranjoo Seodu. "Is Confucianism Compatible with care ethics?: A Critique." Philosophy East and West 53.4: 471-489.
  • Hoagland, Sarah. Lesbian Ethics. Palo Alto, CA: Institute of Lesbian Studies, 1988.
  • Hoagland, Sarah Lucia. "Some Thoughts about Caring." Feminist Ethics. Ed. Claudia Card. Lawrence, KS: University of Kansas Press, 1991.
  • Jaggar, Allison. ""Feminist Ethics: Problems, Projects, Prospects." Feminist Ethics. Lawrence, Kansas: University of Kansas, 1991. 78- 104.
  • Kheel, Marti. Nature Ethics. New York, NY: Rowman & Littlefield, 2008.
  • Kittay, Eva Feder and Myers, Diana T., ed. Women and Moral Theory. U.S.A.: Rowman and Littlefield, 1987.
  • Kittay, Eva Feder. Love's Labor: Essays on Women, Equality, and Dependency. New York, NY: Routledge, 1999.
  • Koehn, Daryl. Rethinking Feminist Ethics. New York, NY: Routledge, 1998.
  • Kuhse, Helga. Caring: Nurses, Women and Ethics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997.
  • Kuhse, H. "Clinical Nursing: 'Yes' to Caring, 'No' to Female Ethics of Care." Bioethics 9.3 (1995): 207-219.
  • Lai Tao, Julia Po-Wah. "Two Perspectives of Care: Confucian Ren and Feminst Care." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 27.2 (2000): 215-40.
  • Larrabee, Mary Jeane, ed. An Ethic of Care: Feminist and Interdisciplinary Perspectives. New York, NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Li, Chenyang, ed. The Sage and the Second Sex: Confucianism, Ethics, and Gender. Chicago, IL: Open Court Press, 2000.
  • Lijun, Yuan. "Ethics of Care and the Concept of Jen: A Reply to Chenyang LI." Hypatia 17.1 (2002): 107-129.
  • Ma, John Paley. " Virtues of Autonomy: The Kantian Ethics of Care." Nursing Philosophy 3.2 (2002): 133-43.
  • Manning, Rita. Speaking from the Heart: A Feminist Perspective on Ethics. New York: NY: Rowman and Littlefield, 1992.
  • Manning, R. “Caring for Animals”. In Adams, C. and Donovan, J (ed.s) Beyond Animal Rights:  A feminist Caring Ethic for the Treatment of Animals. New York:  Continuum, 1996.
  • Mayeroff, Milton. On Caring. New York: Harper & Row, 1971.
  • McLaren, Margaret. "Feminist Ethics: Care as a Virtue." In Feminists Doing Ethics. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2001.
  • Miller, Sarah Clark. "A Kantian Ethic of Care?." In Andrew, Keller and Schwartzman (ed.s) Feminist Interventions in Ethics and Politics: Feminist Ethics and Social Theory. Boulder: CO: Rowman & Littlefield, 2005. 111-127.
  • Nagl-Docekal H. (1997) Feminist ethics: how it could benefit from Kant's moral philosophy. In: Feminist Interpretations of Immanuel Kant (ed. R.M. Schott), pp. 101124. Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, Pennsylvania.
  • Nelson, Hilde. "Against Caring." The Journal of Clinical Ethics (1997): 8-15.
  • Noddings, Nel. Caring: A Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education. Berkeley: University of CA Press, 1982.
  • Noddings, Nel. Starting at Home: Caring and Social Policy. Berkeley, CA: University of CA Press, 2002.
  • Puka, Bill. "The Liberation of Caring: A Different Voice for Gilligan's 'Different Voice'." Hypatia 55.1 (1990): 58-82.
  • Rachels, James. The Elements of Moral Philosophy. San Francisco, CA:  McGraw-Hill, 1999.
  • Robinson, Fiona. Globalizing Care: Ethics, Feminist Theory, and International Relations. Boulder, CO: West View Press, 1999.
  • Ruddick, Sara. Maternal Thinking: Toward a Politics of Peace. New York, NY: Ballentine Books, 1989.
  • Ruddick, Sara. ”Care as Labor and Relationship” in Mark S. Haflon and Joram C. Haber (ed.s) Norms and Values: Essays on the Work of Virginia Held. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1998.
  • Sander-Staudt, Maureen. "The Unhappy Marriage of Care Ethics and Virtue Ethics." Hypatia 21.4 (2006): 21-40.
  • Sevenhuijsen, Selma. Citizenship and the Ethics of Care. New York, NY: Routledge, 1998.
  • Slote, Michael. “The Justice of caring” In Virtues and Vices. Paul, Miller, and Paul (ed.s) New York:  Cambridge University Press. 1998a.
  • Slote, M. Caring in the Balance” in Norms and Values. Haber, Halfon (ed.s). Lanham, MD:  Rowman & Littlefield. 1998b.
  • Slote, M. The Ethics of Care and Empathy." New York, NY: Routledge, 2007.
  • Star, Daniel. "Do Confucians really Care? A Defense of the Distinctiveness of care ethics: A Reply to Chenyang Li." Hypatia 17.1 (2002): 77-106.
  • Stone, Deborah. "Why we need a Care Movement." The Nation Feb. 25 (2000): 1-5.
  • Tronto, Joan. Moral Boundaries: A Political Argument for an Ethic of Care. New York, NY: Routledge, 1994.
  • Tronto, J. “Women and Caring:  What can Feminists learn about morality from Caring?” in V. Held, Justice and Care:  Essential Readings in Feminist Ethics Boulder, CO:  Westview Press (2006) 101-115.
  • Tucker, Judith Stadtman. “Care as a Cause: Framing the Twenty-First Century Mother’s Movement.”. In Hamington, Maurice and Miller, Dorothy (ed.s) Socializing Care, New York: NY, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2006.
  • Walker, Vanessa Siddle and Snarey, John, ed. Race-Ing Moral Formation: African American Perspectives on Care and Justice. New York, NY: Teachers College Press, 2004.
  • West, Robin. Caring for Justice. New York, NY: New York University Press, 2000.


Author Information

Maureen Sander-Staudt
Arizona State University
U. S. A.

Feminist Standpoint Theory

Feminist standpoint theorists make three principal claims: (1) Knowledge is socially situated. (2) Marginalized groups are socially situated in ways that make it more possible for them to be aware of things and ask questions than it is for the non-marginalized. (3) Research, particularly that focused on power relations, should begin with the lives of the marginalized. Feminist standpoint theory, then, makes a contribution to epistemology, to methodological debates in the social and natural sciences, to philosophy of science, and to political activism. It has been one of the most influential and debated theories to emerge from second-wave feminist thinking. Feminist standpoint theories place relations between political and social power and knowledge center-stage. These theories are both descriptive and normative, describing and analyzing the causal effects of power structures on knowledge while also advocating a specific route for enquiry, a route that begins from standpoints emerging from shared political struggle within marginalized lives. Feminist standpoint theories emerged in the 1970s, in the first instance from Marxist feminist and feminist critical theoretical approaches within a range of social scientific disciplines. They thereby offer epistemological and methodological approaches that are specific to a variety of disciplinary frameworks, but share a commitment to acknowledging, analyzing and drawing on power/knowledge relationships, and on bringing about change which results in more just societies. Feminist scholars working within a number of disciplines—such as Dorothy Smith, Nancy Hartsock, Hilary Rose, Sandra Harding, Patricia Hill Collins, Alison Jaggar and Donna Haraway—have advocated taking women’s lived experiences, particularly experiences of (caring) work, as the beginning of scientific enquiry. Central to all these standpoint theories are feminist analyses and critiques of relations between material experience, power, and epistemology, and of the effects of power relations on the production of knowledge.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Historical Roots of Feminist Standpoint Theory
  3. Central Themes in Feminist Standpoint Theory
  4. What is a Standpoint?
  5. Acquiring Knowledge via Standpoints
  6. The Outsider Within
  7. Controversies
    1. False Universalism
    2. Epistemic Relativism
    3. The Bias Paradox
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Works Cited
    2. Earlier Papers
    3. Recent Contributions

1. Introduction

At first blush there appears a tension between the traditional epistemological assumption that a general, universal and abstract account of knowledge and scientific enquiry is possible, and the politically inflected feminist claim that such analyses are only properly understood in the social contexts in which they arise, and in terms of the biases and prejudices those contexts generate. From the outset, then, feminist epistemologies seem to be located within the contradictory pull of the politicized material and experiential concerns of feminism and the abstract universal concerns of epistemology. Feminist epistemological projects began as a critique of that tradition but have evolved beyond the critical to reframe and reconceptualize the problems of knowledge and the epistemological project itself. Feminist epistemology does not adopt a monolithic critical position with respect to a traditional canon of epistemological work; rather it consists of a variety of feminist epistemological approaches, of which feminist standpoint epistemologies form a strand.

Here feminist standpoint theory is examined primarily as a feminist epistemology and as a methodology for feminist researchers in the social sciences where, arguably, feminist standpoint theory has had the most influence and been the subject of most debate. As with feminist theories generally, it would be somewhat misleading to represent feminist standpoint theory as a single set of epistemological commitments or a single methodological approach. More appropriate would be to think of them in terms of ‘standpoint theories’. Nevertheless, standpoint theories share common commitments and approaches, which are taken as the focus here. Aspects of those theories that attract controversy both within and outside of the intellectual conversations in which feminist standpoint theories have been developed and employed are also briefly discussed.

2. Historical Roots of Feminist Standpoint Theory

The genealogy of feminist standpoint theory begins in Hegel’s account of the master/slave dialectic, and subsequently in Marx and, particularly, Lukacs’ development of the idea of the standpoint of the proletariat. Hegel argued that the oppressed slave can eventually reach a state of freedom of consciousness as a result of her/his realization of self-consciousness through struggles against the master, and via involvement through physical labor in projects that enable her/him to fashion the world—to affect it in various ways. Hegel’s analysis of the struggle inherent in the master/slave relationship gave rise to the insight that oppression and injustice are better analyzed and understood from the point of view of the slave than from that of the master. Marx and Engels, and, later, Lukacs developed this Hegelian idea within the framework of the dialectic of class consciousness, thereby giving rise to the notion of a standpoint of the proletariat (the producers of capital) as an epistemic position that, it was argued, provided a superior starting point for understanding and eventually changing the world than that of the controllers and owners of capital. The Hegelian and Marxist traditions, then, provide the genesis of standpoint theorists’ claim that the ‘double vision’ afforded to those who experience social relations from a position of marginality can, under certain circumstances, offer them epistemic advantage.

Although their genealogy begins in the Hegelian and Marxist traditions, some current feminist standpoint theories are also located squarely within an empiricist tradition in epistemology. These feminist epistemologies extend the traditional empiricist commitment to experience and observation as the starting points for knowledge. Following Quine and his successors, they recognize and acknowledge that observation is theory-laden and that those theories themselves are artifacts of our making. They also draw on the insight that a set of observation-based data can serve as equally credible evidence for more than one of those theories.

3. Central Themes in Feminist Standpoint Theory

Feminist standpoint theorists such as sociologists Dorothy Smith and Patricia Hill Collins, political philosophers Nancy Hartsock and Alison Jaggar, sociologist of science Hilary Rose, and philosopher of science Sandra Harding extended and reframed the idea of the standpoint of the proletariat to mark out the logical space for a feminist standpoint. Their principal claim regarding feminist standpoint theories is that certain socio-political positions occupied by women (and by extension other groups who lack social and economic privilege) can become sites of epistemic privilege and thus productive starting points for enquiry into questions about not only those who are socially and politically marginalized, but also those who, by dint of social and political privilege, occupy the positions of oppressors. This claim is captured by Sandra Harding thus: "Starting off research from women’s lives will generate less partial and distorted accounts not only of women’s lives but also of men’s lives and of the whole social order." [1993:  56]

Following Marxist tradition in rejecting liberal assumptions that social and historical factors are irrelevant to epistemic questions, central tenets of feminist standpoint theories include their recognition of the role of social and historical location in shaping epistemic agents and their knowledge, and an embrace of that location as a potentially valuable contribution to knowledge.  Feminist standpoint theories work towards an epistemic approach that continues to value objectivity (albeit rethought and reworked) as a goal of enquiry, while at the same time accommodating, analyzing and understanding the effects of social location on epistemic agents and on knowledge. This stance is in stark contrast to the relatively pervasive traditional assumption that recognizing the effects of the socio-historical location of epistemic agents rather than abstracting them from that location disrupts enquiry. Feminist standpoint theories, then, involve a commitment to the view that all attempts to know are socially situated. The social situation of an epistemic agent—her gender, class, race, ethnicity, sexuality and physical capacities—plays a role in forming what we know and limiting what we are able to know. They can affect what we are capable of knowing and what we are permitted to know. The influence of social location on epistemic content and capacity can be felt throughout our epistemic practices, shaping not only the way in which we understand the world, but also the way in which it is presented to us via experience. Consider the following example offered by Terri Elliot:

Person A approaches a building and enters it unproblematically. As she approaches she sees something perfectly familiar which, if asked, she might call ‘The Entrance’. Person X approaches the same building and sees a great stack of stairs and the glaring lack of a ramp for her wheelchair. [1994: 424]

The experience of person A is of the entrance to a building. Whereas the experience of person X is of a barrier to entrance and (at best) an inconvenience. Person X’s social location—qua person with a disability—means that the building presents differently to her from how it does to someone without a disability.

Feminist standpoint theories seek, moreover, to go beyond analysis and description of the role played by social location in structuring and shaping knowledge. The normative aspect of feminist standpoint theories manifests firstly in a commitment to the thesis that the ways in which power relations inflect knowledge need not be understood as with a subjectivity that threatens their objectivity; rather that socially situated knowledge can be properly objective. Secondly, feminist standpoint theories’ normative weight is felt via their commitment to the claim, developed by extension of the Marxist view of the epistemic status of the standpoint of the proletariat, that some social locations, specifically marginalized locations, are epistemically superior in that they afford hitherto unrecognized epistemic privilege, thereby correcting falsehoods and revealing previously suppressed truths. Thus, as Sandra Harding puts it, "Standpoint theories map how a social and political disadvantage can be turned into an epistemic, scientific and political advantage." [2004; 7-8]

Standpoint theories, then, move beyond a descriptive situated-knowledge thesis to a normative thesis, among the transformative objectives of which is a more socially just world.

4. What is a Standpoint?

The concept of a standpoint employed in feminist standpoint theories takes a narrow meaning, owed to Marxist theory, according to which a standpoint is an achieved collective identity or consciousness. The establishment of a standpoint is the political achievement of those whose social location forms its starting point; it is not merely ascribed from beyond that location. There is a consensus among feminist standpoint theorists that a standpoint is not merely a perspective that is occupied simply by dint of being a woman. Whereas a perspective is occupied as a matter of the fact of one’s socio-historical position and may well provide the starting point for the emergence of a standpoint, a standpoint is earned through the experience of collective political struggle, a struggle that requires, as Nancy Hartsock puts it, both science and politics [Harding 2004: p. 8]. By way of emphasis of this point, Hartsock uses the label ‘feminist standpoint’ whereas Dorothy Smith uses the label ‘women’s standpoint’, reflecting the way in which standpoint theory argues for “women’s place” as a starting point for enquiry [Harding 2004: 21].

So while both the dominant and the dominated occupy perspectives, the dominated are much more successfully placed to achieve a standpoint. Nevertheless, it is not impossible for those who occupy non-marginalized perspectives to become part of the process of helping reach a shared critical consciousness with respect to the effects of power structures on epistemic production. There are many different lives consisting of many different activities and many different social relations and, thus, potentially many different consciousnesses and many different standpoints. The ongoing political and epistemic project of achieving a standpoint offers critical insights that give rise to a new perspective on reality. Sandra Harding explains the point thus,

Only through such struggles can we begin to see beneath the appearances created by an unjust social order to the reality of how this social order is in fact constructed and maintained. This need for struggle emphasizes the fact that a feminist standpoint is not something that anyone can have simply by claiming it. It is an achievement. A standpoint differs in this respect from a perspective, which anyone can have simply by ‘opening one’s eyes’. [1991:  127]

5. Acquiring Knowledge via Standpoints

According to feminist standpoint theories, the process of achieving knowledge begins when standpoints begin to emerge. They emerge when those who are marginalized and relatively invisible from the vantage point of the epistemically privileged become conscious of their social situation with respect to socio-political power and oppression, and begin to find a voice. It is no historical accident that feminist standpoint theory emerged in academic discourses more or less contemporaneously with the feminist consciousness movement within feminist activism. This demonstrates the way in which feminist standpoint theories are grounded in feminist political practice. Contrary to the tendency of critics who perceive feminist standpoint theory via an individualist lens, mistakenly reducing the notion of a standpoint to an individual’s social location, the emergence of standpoints is a collective process occurring through the recognition and acknowledgment of others who occupy more or less the same standpoint as oneself. Although such narratives may form a starting point, the emergence of a standpoint does not consist merely in the telling of individual women’s narratives. Self-definition in terms of a standpoint provides a starting point for the self-assertion of one’s own identity, challenging those identities imposed by conventional stereotypes that form part of hegemonic ways of thinking from the point of view of the socially and politically dominant. This assertion of identity—of who I am—adds to a body of knowledge about how my life is and how I experience the world. Those truths debunk myths about me, about my relationship with the world, and about my relationships with others in that world that have heretofore been taken to be true. In this vein, Patricia Hill Collins discusses a stereotypical understanding of African American women working as domestic servants—the Mammy stereotype which objectifies black women as ‘faithful and obedient’ domestic servants, dedicated to the care of their white family—in contrast to the Sapphire, controlling and manipulative, or the Jezebel, a temptress [1990; 456].  As Collins shows, stereotypes such as these serve as ‘controlling images’ that serve to reinforce for everyone, including African American women, the ways of thinking from the point of view of the racially and sexually dominant. This way of thinking oppresses as it constrains what can be known about being an African American woman. African American women, rather than racist and sexist social structures, are blamed for that oppression. Thus the epistemic process whereby a standpoint emerges enables the occupants of that standpoint to gain an element of power and control over knowledge about their lives. In becoming occupants of a standpoint, they also become knowing subjects in their own right, rather than merely objects that are known by others.

As shown by the claim from Harding that appears at the end of the previous section, feminist standpoint theorists argue that the epistemic and political advantages of beginning enquiry from within women’s lived experiences are not limited to providing a truer account of those lives, but of all the lives and socio-political relations within which those lives are enmeshed. Initial enquiry in women’s lived experiences, mediated by the politicized consciousness that emerges within a feminist standpoint, reveals the way in which male-dominated ideologies distort reality. Standpoints make visible aspects of social relations and of the natural world that are unavailable from dominant perspectives, and in so doing they generate the kinds of questions that will lead to a more complete and true account of those relations. Feminist standpoint theorists point out that, in order to survive within social structures in which one is oppressed, one is required to understand practices of oppression, to understand both oppressed and oppressor; but, this epistemic bi-polarity is neither required of, nor available to, the dominant. For example, the colonized have to learn the language of the colonizer—the New Zealand Māori learned English while use of the Māori language was strongly discouraged, for instance—in order to survive colonization, but the colonizer need not learn the language of the colonized in order to survive. The colonized, then, have some means of entry into the world of the colonizer, and the potential for gaining some understanding of how the world works from that perspective, but the colonizer is generally shut out of the world of the colonized and restricted to a mono-visual view of how the world is. The double vision afforded via the social location of women and other marginalized groups can provide the epistemic advantage of insights into social relations that are unavailable to the non-marginalized. An illustration of the way in which the often undervalued, messy caring work (caring for the sick and the elderly, bearing and raising children, unrewarding, unpaid domestic labor, emotional labor) in which women are traditionally engaged offers productive epistemic starting points; Hartsock cites a passage from Marilyn French’s novel The Women’s Room:

Washing the toilet used by three males, and the floor and walls around it, is, Mira thought, coming face to face with necessity. And that is why women were saner than men, did not come up with the made, absurd schemes men developed; they were in touch with necessity, they had to wash the toilet bowl and the floor. [Harding 2004: 43; French, 1978: 214]

Mediated via a critical standpoint, Mira’s lived experience could form a wellspring of epistemic insights not only into the gender power relations of which her situation (cleaning up men’s mess) is a result, but also of the basic necessities of all our lives and of the need to ensure that they are met equitably. Thus, from this starting point in the material condition of women’s lives, questions arise that would not otherwise get asked, and these questions can form rich sites for research, for policy reform and, ultimately, for social change. For instance, such questions might address issues such as violence against women—why is it so prevalent in so many societies against women of all classes and races, and why are women so often blamed for it? While violence against women remains an ongoing challenge and tragedy, women have derived epistemic advantage from the conceptual resources and clearer understanding of violence that has been afforded to them within feminist standpoints. In turn, this stronger understanding has flowed into social and political discourses to the extent that, at least in some parts of the world, violence is no longer considered acceptable or part of the normal dynamics of a marriage or partnership. Moreover, campaigning by women and their male allies has resulted, in some jurisdictions, in an anti-violence policy environment, and in legal protection and redress for women. Moreover, women’s feminist stand against family violence has (among other factors) motivated researchers to look for and critically analyze the causes and conditions of family violence, such as poverty and inter-generational family violence. In so doing, they have widened understanding of, and enquiry into, family violence more generally to encompass violence perpetrated on children, on male partners, and on elders. Other sites of enquiry that emerge from women’s lived experience might include:  Gender equity in the workplace—why are women so over-represented in low-paid and under- or unvalued caring work?; Gender equity in the domestic sphere—why is it often considered normal or usual for a woman to work a double shift, one outside the home and one at home?; Bodies and their normal biological processes—why are menstruation, birthing and menopause understood as medical problems to be treated as illnesses?; Women’s bodies and objectification—why do women’s bodies continue to be used to promote and sell products that run the gamut from instant coffee powder to motorsport?

The development of a standpoint by the dominated dissipates the conceptual dissonance experienced by someone who has been forced to adopt dominant conceptual frameworks that do not truly belong to them. Conceptual frameworks emanating from patriarchal systems fail to provide cognitive tools that enable women and others who are marginalized to make sense of their experiences in and of the world. The emergence of appropriate conceptual frameworks furnishes the marginalized with the cognitive tools to become epistemic subjects, whereas previously they are merely known by others. It enables them to name and think about their experiences in ways that properly represent those experiences. That is not to say that existing conceptual frameworks have been of no use whatsoever for women, for even this conceptual dissonance has been mediated and expressed within those frameworks. Rather, thinking from within a standpoint enables the emergence of conceptual frameworks which resolve the contradictions that arise, and fill the gaps and silences that are left empty when using a conceptual framework that is not entirely fit for purpose.

Some critics of standpoint theories have charged that their central claim of epistemic advantage amounts to a claim of automatic epistemic privilege. However, as we have seen in Section 4, a standpoint is not equivalent to a social location and the standpoint theorist’s claim is not that epistemic advantage is bestowed by dint of one’s social location, but that it is rather earned through involvement in collective political struggle. Theorists argue that experiences of the marginalized reveal problems to be explained; problems that can become research agendas or policy issues/initiatives and are a source of objectivity-maximizing questions. Such questions force us to examine the beliefs, prejudices and biases of the dominant groups in society, the propositions that have previously counted as knowledge. It is in this way, feminist standpoint theorists propose, that we achieve less partial and distorted understandings of all of our lives than we do if we allow questions about those lives to originate only from the experiences of dominant groups. The realities of women’s lives, then, can provide sites of enquiry that lead to new, more complete, less partial, and more objective knowledge.

Moreover, as Alison Wylie argues [2004: 345-6], standpoint theorists’ situated-knowledge claims explicitly undermine the conventional assumption that objective epistemic agents are non-specifically located, and that they are neutral and disinterested with respect to the subject of their enquiry. In so doing, however, standpoint theorists’ approach to the method of enquiry demonstrates a commitment to what are typically taken to be its virtues when it is scientific: empirical adequacy, construed as either empirical depth or breadth; internal coherence; inferential robustness; consistency with relevant well-established bodies of knowledge; and, explanatory power. Indeed, as Wylie notes, feminist interventions in social and scientific enquiry have been successful in demonstrating how it thus far has not always manifested those virtues. Standpoint theorists move beyond this critical moment, showing how the inclusion of lived realities, not yet properly visible to enquirers, can make for better-supported hypotheses. In a case study of archaeology considered in their article “Coming to Terms with the Values of Science”, Wylie and Nelson point out the ways in which researchers taking a gender-sensitive standpoint with respect to studies on netting and basketry and on skeletal remains have resulted in (among other things) a widening of the evidential base of archaeological enquiry in these areas, leading to the re-examination of established hypotheses [2007: 64-70].

6. The Outsider Within

The epistemic advantage of the ‘double vision’ afforded to those in the position of being outsiders within is a recurring theme of feminist standpoint theories. Several theorists emphasize the epistemic advantage afforded to those forced conceptually to straddle both sides of a dichotomous social divide. That advantage is captured by black feminist critic Bell Hooks’ description of growing up in small-town Kentucky thus:

Living as we did—on the edge—we developed a particular way of seeing reality. We looked both from the outside in and from the inside out...we understood both. [1984: vii]

Patricia Hill Collins, for instance, considers black feminist academics to occupy a position of potential epistemic privilege in so far as they are, on the one hand, insiders by dint of their position as authentic academics; yet, on the other hand, outsiders in so far as they are women and black, thus remaining to some extent decentered within the context of the Academy. This places them in a unique position from which to understand how things are in the Academy from the perspective of an insider who enjoys some degree of power and privilege both professionally and personally as a result of her membership, and who at the same time has an understanding of how things are from the perspective of one who is marginalized with respect to the centre of that power as a result of her gender and race. The dual perspective available to someone in this position leaves her well-placed to recognize the underlying assumptions and evaluative commitments that drive and shape the dynamics of power within the Academy, while at the same time providing her with a critical frame of reference derived from her own experience of the Academy, within which to potentially gain a better understanding of its power structures and dynamics. A dual perspective such as this, then, could form the basis of a feminist standpoint which would generate challenging questions about the social and political structures that engender the reality that black women academics experience in their professional and personal lives. In addition, standpoint theories offer explanatory resources for understanding how this dual positioning can potentially bestow epistemic advantage.

The self-reflexivity inherent in the identification of this insider/outsider position as a potentially advantaged epistemic location connects with the broader feminist theme of the (often vexed) relationship between feminist practice and feminist theory. Several feminist standpoint theorists’ work starts in their own lives, their initial site of analysis is the material experience of women as academics and scientists. Feminist sociologist Dorothy Smith argues that women sociologists are placed at the centre of a contradiction in the relation of their discipline to their experience of the world. This contradiction leads to a ‘bifurcation of consciousness’ [Harding 2004: p. 27]. On one side of that divide is the conceptual practice of academic work conducted within the conceptual structures of the discipline of sociology; and on the other, the concrete of the domestic sphere. She argues that sociological discourse has been authored and authorized by men, noting that the frames of reference against which its discourses of enquiry and discussion take place have their origins in men’s lived experiences, not women’s. The sociologist is thus conceived of as male, and women cannot be afforded the status of full participants in the practices of sociology without suffering a ‘double estrangement’. To gain legitimacy and status as sociologists they must suspend their identities qua women.

In her “Hand, Brain and Heart: A Feminist Epistemology for the Natural Sciences”, Hilary Rose makes similar points with respect to women in the natural sciences—‘Women Scientists in the Men’s Laboratories’, as she puts it [Harding 2004: 75]. Those women also have to negotiate the contradictory demands of private and professional spheres. Drawing on physicist Evelyn Fox Keller’s accounts of her experiences as a student (which includes narrative of male students avoiding her and a male university teacher not countenancing the possibility that she could solve mathematical problems without male help), Rose, like Smith, identifies a split in the woman scientist’s consciousness: she is ‘cut in two’, her abstract, conceptual scientific labor arises in ‘painful contradiction’ with her caring labor [Harding 2004: 76]. The implicit requirement that a woman suppress part of herself in order to acquire any professional credibility is one reason, Rose argues, why women scientists were, and in some disciplines remain, comparative rarities.

Thus, while the outsider-within position can afford the epistemic advantage of ‘double vision’ in the absence of the kind of political context and consciousness of which a standpoint is constituted, those benefits can remain unrealized as women scientists suppress their identity as women and as feminists in order to pass as scientists. As Uma Narayan has argued, it should be acknowledged that this colonialized bi-culturalism has a ‘dark side’ [Harding 2004: 221-3] with which women adopt various strategies to survive. In order to negotiate and cope, the best she can, with various contexts in which she finds herself having to operate, a woman might suppress part of herself in some of those contexts while assuming the persona best suited to each. Thus some women professionals emphasize only those characteristics considered valuable in their professional context, allowing themselves to be women and feminist only in private contexts. Alternatively, a woman might simply try to imitate the traits, habits and practices of the dominant group while suppressing herself entirely. For the feminist standpoint theorist, an alternative to these strategies is to attempt to remain within the contradictory contexts, and to do so critically. This is, potentially, the most epistemically powerful response, but it is also the most challenging given the risk of alienation from oneself and from those with whom one may have the most in common.

The difficulty of surmounting such challenges might account, in part, for the tension inherent in many feminist standpoint theorists’ accounts of epistemic insight. This tension arises between, on the one hand, recognition that epistemic insights occur as a result of an individual’s insider/outsider experience and, on the other, the central claim that a standpoint is a shared, rather than an individual, achievement. Perhaps the existence of this tension reinforces the claim that, while epistemic insight is achievable on the basis of individual insider/outsider experience, it is only from the political context and shared consciousness of a standpoint that such insights can be truly advantageous and move those within it from improved understanding of the realities of their lives towards social and political change.

7. Controversies

More than three decades have passed since the publication of the first work that developed and advocated feminist standpoint theories. Yet standpoint theory remains controversial and its controversies manifest both between and beyond feminist scholars, as Alison Wylie writes,

Standpoint theory may rank as one of the most contentious theories to have been proposed and debated in the twenty-five to thirty year history of second-wave feminist thinking about knowledge and science. Its advocates, as much as its critics, disagree vehemently about its parentage, its status as a theory, and crucially, its relevance to current thinking about knowledge. [Harding 2004: 339-40]

This section outlines what are perhaps the most significant challenges to feminist standpoint theory.

a. False Universalism

Since feminist standpoint theories take the view that enquiry is best started from within women’s material experience and that epistemic advantage ensues from within standpoints that emerge from that experience, they can mistakenly be understood to espouse an essentialist universalism, according to which women are afforded automatic epistemic privilege simply for the fact of their being women. Since feminist standpoint theorists argue that enquiry is best started from women’s lives, and that standpoints emerge only when women begin to reflect upon and question the reality of those lives through a politicized framework, feminist standpoint theories can also be misunderstood as proposing a single, monolithic feminist standpoint. This misunderstanding presents this feminist standpoint as arising not from ordinary women’s lives but from the lives of relatively privileged, mostly middle-class, mostly white, women academics.

A good proportion of the work that has since built on early moments in feminist standpoint theory has focused on incorporating considerations of difference within feminist standpoint theories. Feminist standpoint theories are clearly not committed to the project of formulating a homogenous women’s or feminist standpoint. Rather, they recognize that women’s presence in many areas of the terrain of social and economic marginalization means that women occupy positions at the intersection of a number of oppressive social structures.

However, reconciliation between feminist standpoint theories and those feminist theories which prioritize difference remains problematic and presents a dilemma: The formation of a standpoint requires shared experiences of oppression and of struggle against that oppression. But the inclusion of those experiences within a standpoint, it can be argued, runs the risk of occluding epistemically significant differences between women. A feminist standpoint may be taken (implicitly) as the position of all women, but what account is taken of class, race, sexuality, and other markers of difference, which structure the power relations that generate oppression, the shared experience of which forms the basis of the standpoint? The response to this dilemma from within standpoint theory has been, firstly, to emphasize that feminist standpoint theories envisage a plurality of feminist standpoints; and, secondly, to modify feminist standpoint theories to take account of the ways in which women’s different experiences at the intersections of various oppressive social structures will engender different standpoints. Patricia Hill Collins and Bell Hooks, for example, have developed black feminist standpoint theories that take into account the role of women of color in slavery and in devalued menial and caring labor, and the way in which this oppression is experienced at the hands of other, mostly white, women.

Thirdly, some feminist standpoint theorists respond head-on to the charge that by focusing on the experiences that are common to most women, standpoint theories fail to take account of significant differences between women. Maria Mies and Vandana Shiva, for example, participate in the feminist standpoint conversation from within their own experiences as activists in the women’s and ecology movements. They argue, contrary to the charge of false universalization, that there are many examples of women’s activism in pursuit of environmental causes which demonstrate the reality of women overcoming differences and developing a shared sense of solidarity through which they begin to gain an understanding of the oppressive relations in which their lives are enmeshed [Harding, 2004: 334-5]. Thus, as standpoints emerge, some differences will be occluded, but some significant similarities will be thrown into sharper relief.

Postmodernist feminist critics argue not only that the risk of occlusion of difference remains but, more fatally with respect to the possibility of reconciliation, the categories upon which feminist standpoint theory depends—woman, feminist, knowledge—are fluid and in a state of socially influenced flux and contestation, making it impossible ever properly to capture experiences and identities within standpoints. Standpoint theorists counter that the idea that identity is fluid itself puts the political power of feminism at risk and threatens the loss of the material experience of women’s oppression. Standpoint and postmodernist feminism remain opposed in this respect: the former requires materiality as its starting point, the latter rejects the reality of that ‘real world’ outright. As Haraway puts the point from the perspective of the former position:

[T]o lose authoritative biological accounts of sex, which set up productive tensions with its binary pair, gender, seems to be to lose too much; it seems to be to lose not just analytical power within a particular Western tradition, but the body itself as anything but a blank page for social inscriptions, including those of biological discourse. [Harding 2004: p. 94]

b. Epistemic Relativism

The charge that feminist standpoint epistemologies are committed to a politically dangerous epistemic relativism ensues from the claim that all knowledge is socially situated and that some social values enhance the process of enquiry and the acquisition of knowledge.

In response to this charge, Sandra Harding reconceptualizes objectivity, arguing for the pursuit of strong objectivity [1993: passim]. Harding argues that standpoint theory imposes a rigorous logic of discovery involving a strong demand for ongoing reflection and self-critique from within a standpoint, enabling the justification of socially-situated knowledge claims. This critical approach, Harding asserts, results in a stronger notion of objectivity than that achieved by traditional approaches to enquiry. The traditional starting point for knowledge is the position of the dominant and, despite assumptions to the contrary, that position is ideologically permeated. This results in partial and distorted accounts of reality, which thereby fail to live up to modernistic standards of impartiality, neutrality and universality associated with a commitment to epistemic objectivity.

With regard to the idea that the reconceptualization of objectivity represents a retreat from modernity, rationality and science [Walby, 2001: 489], Harding labels her feminist standpoint approach ‘neo-modern’ [2001: 518]. By these lights, feminist standpoint theories remain committed to strengthening modernist commitments to truth and objectivity, but are distanced from modernity’s absolutist overtones. Strong objectivity encompasses a sense of completeness and a lack of distortion. The ultimate epistemic goal of enquiry based on this model would be the inclusion of all standpoints, enabling the revelation of different aspects of truth. This would be a dialectical process consistent with standpoint theories’ roots in the Marxist tradition. Objective enquiry modelled thus requires trust—we need to trust others truthfully to reveal aspects of reality. Conceived thus, objectivity is not a goal that is easily achievable.

c. The Bias Paradox

Some, such as Helen Longino [1993] and Susan Hekman [1997] have argued that two of the central tenets of feminist standpoint theories—the claim that knowledge is socially situated and the claim that marginalized standpoints (but not perspectives) offer epistemic advantage—are in deep tension with each other. On the one hand, it is claimed that there is no standpoint-neutral vantage point from which to make judgements about the relative epistemic superiority of certain standpoints over other ways of knowing the world; while on the other it is claimed that marginalized standpoints are, indeed, epistemically better than the epistemic positions of the non-marginalized. If this tension cannot be resolved, it is argued, the standpoint theorist is pushed back towards the relativistic embrace of ‘multiple and incompatible knowledge positions’ [Longino 1993: 107].

Harding’s ‘strong objectivity’ suggests a possible dissolution of this apparent tension. Responses to the claim of a bias paradox offered by Rebecca Kukla [2006] and Kristina Rollins can be understood as means by which Harding’s notion can be realized. Both draw upon the resources of contextual approaches to epistemic justification to show how taking account of the social location of epistemic agents can strengthen knowledge claims. Kukla draws upon and extends Wilfrid Sellars’ account of perceptual warrant to argue for an account of epistemic objectivity in which contingent, contextual factors such as gender and race are recognized as sources of justification for knowledge claims, rather than rejected as disruptors of ‘aperspectival’ objective epistemic endeavor [2006: 86-7]. Only when we are socially located in certain respects, Kukla argues, can we best perceive certain aspects of reality.

Rollins, meanwhile, argues that the bias paradox arises out of a foundationalist framework: The standard of impartiality against which standpoints would be assessed involves basic, foundational beliefs and, according to foundationalism, these cannot be socially situated; hence, the tension between standpoint theories’ epistemic advantage thesis on the one hand and situated knowledge thesis on the other. Drawing and expanding upon the resources of Michael Williams’ contextualism, Rollins argues that by offering a standard of impartiality provided by a context of default entitlements whose status as such is always context-dependent, contextualism shows how it is possible to establish standards of epistemic justification that are themselves situated knowledge claims [2006: 129]. It is against a background of a standard such as this that it would be possible to claim, without retreat to relativism, that marginalized standpoints can offer epistemic advantage.

Generally, with respect to their commitment to objectivity, then, feminist standpoint theories can be understood as attempts to synthesize the elements that usually create an inherent tension in feminist and emancipationist projects. This tension arises from acknowledging the epistemic value of the inescapable social situation and dependence of epistemic subjects and of knowledge, and yet remaining committed to the idea that we don’t make the world up. Feminist standpoint theory attempts to occupy a position that incorporates both epistemic deference to the world and acceptance of the way in which that world and the ways we experience and understand it are shaped by our material circumstances. Feminist standpoint theory is also informed by an acceptance of the way in which different experiences, needs and interests give rise to different practices, and different ways of thinking about and interacting with the world, some of which are better than others. Real knowledge on this view just is socially situated; it is interested as opposed to disinterested [Harding 2004: 24-25]. In this vein, feminist standpoint theory serves as a critique of conventional epistemic standards, arguing that what Donna Haraway dubbed ‘the God Trick’—the traditional epistemic view that knowledge is only achieved by adopting a disinterested, impartial view from nowhere—is unachievable, for knowledge is always from somewhere [Harding, 2004:  93].

8. References and Further Reading

Many of the seminal articles on feminist standpoint theories, including the papers by Dorothy Smith, Nancy Hartsock, Hilary Rose, Patricia Hill Collins and Donna Haraway mentioned here are now collected together in Harding’s The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader. Harding’s collection also includes more recent papers that make new contributions to these debates, including the papers by Mies and Shiva, Narayan and Wylie.

Susan Hekman’s article “Truth and Method: Feminist Standpoint Theory Revisited”, Signs Vol 22, No. 2 (Winter, 1997) provides a critical response to feminist standpoint theories which manifests the tension between standpoint theory and the preoccupations of postmodernist feminism. This article and replies from Harding, Hartsock, Hill Collins and Smith all appear in Harding’s 2004 collection.

a. Works Cited

  • Terri Elliot, “Making Strange What had Appeared Familiar”, The Monist; Oct94, Vol. 77 Issue 4
  • Evelyn Fox Keller, “The Anomaly of a Woman in Physics” in Sara Ruddick and Pamela Daniels, eds., Working it Out: 23 Women, Writers, Scientists and Scholars Talk about their Lives, New York: Pantheon Books, 1977
  • Marilyn French, The Women’s Room, New York: Jove, 1978
  • Sandra Harding Whose Science/ Whose Knowledge? Milton Keynes: Open University Press, 1991
  • Sandra Harding, “Rethinking Standpoint Epistemology: What is Strong Objectivity?” in L. Alcoff and E. Potter, eds., Feminist Epistemologies, New York/London: Routledge, 1993 (also appears in Harding, 2004)
  • Sandra Harding, “Comment on Walby’s ‘Against Epistemological Chasms: The Science Question in Feminism Revisited’: Can Democratic Values and Interests Every Play a Rationally Justifiable Role in the Evaluation of Scientific Work?, Signs, Vol. 26, No. 2 (Winter 2001)
  • Sandra Harding, ed., The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader New York and London: Routledge, 2004
  • Donna Haraway, “Situated Knowledges” in Harding 2004
  • Nancy Hartsock, “The Feminist Standpoint: Developing the Ground for a Specifically Feminist Historical Materialism” in Harding, 2004
  • Patricia Hill Collins, Black Feminist Thought: Knowledge, Consciousness and the Politics of Empowerment, New York and London: Routledge, 1990
  • Patricia Hill Collins, “Learning from the Outsider Within: The Sociological Significance of Black Feminist Thought” in Harding 2004
  • Bell Hooks, From Margin to Center, Boston: South End Press, 1984
  • Rebecca Kukla, “ Objectivity and Perspective in Empirical Knowledge”. Episteme 3(1): 80-95. 2006
  • Helen Longino, ‘Subjects, Power, and Knowledge: Description and Prescription in Feminist Philosophies of Science’ in Feminist Epistemologies, L. Alcoff and E. Potter (eds.), New York: Routledge, 1993, 101-120.
  • Maria Mies and Vandana Shiva, “The Subsistence Perspective” in Harding, 2004
  • Uma Narayan, “The Project of Feminist Epistemology: Perspectives from a Nonwestern Feminist” in Harding, 2004
  • Kristina Rolin, “ The Bias Paradox in Feminist Standpoint Epistemology” Episteme 1(2): 125-136. 2006
  • Hilary Rose, “Hand, Brain and Heart: A Feminist Epistemology for the Natural Sciences” in Harding, 2004
  • Wilfrid Sellars, Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind, Harvard: Harvard University Press, 1997
  • Dorothy Smith, “Women’s Perspective as a Radical Critique of Sociology” in Harding, 2004
  • Sylvia Walby, “Against Epistemological Chasms: the Science Question in Feminism Revisited” Signs, Vol. 26, No. 2 (Winter 2001)
  • Michael Williams, Problems of Knowledge: A Critical Introduction to Epistemology, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 2001
  • Alison Wylie, “Why Standpoint Matters” in Harding, 2004
  • Alison Wylie & Lynn Hankinson Nelson, “Coming to terms with the values of science: Insights from feminist science studies scholarship” In Value-free science: Ideals and illusions, eds. Harold Kincaid, John Dupré, and Alison Wylie. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007

b. Earlier Papers

  • Sally J. Kenney and Helen Kinsella, eds. Politics and Feminist Standpoint Theories, New York and London, The Haworth Press, 1997

c. Recent Contributions

  • Sharon Crasnow, “Feminist anthropology and sociology: Issues for social science” In Handbook of the philosophy of science, Volume 15: Philosophy of anthropology and sociology, 2006
  • Sharon Crasnow, “Is Standpoint Theory a Resource for Feminist Epistemology? An Introduction”  Hypatia 24(4) 2009: 189-192.
  • Sandra Harding, Sciences from below: Feminisms, postcolonialities, and modernities, Raleigh: Duke University Press, 2008.
  • Sandra Harding, “Standpoint Theories: Productively Controversial”,  Hypatia 24(4) 2009: 192-200.
  • Kristen Intemann, “Standpoint empiricism: Rethinking the terrain in feminist philosophy of science”  In New waves in philosophy of science, eds. P.D. Magnus and Jacob Busch. Houndsmills, Basingstoke, Hampshire, UK: Palgrave MacMillan, 2010; 198-225.
  • Kourany, Janet, “The Place of Standpoint Theory in Feminist Science Studies”, Hypatia 24(4) 2009: 209-218.
  • Kourany, Janet, “Standpoint Theory as a Methodology for the Study of Power Relations”, Hypatia 24(4) 2009: 218-226.
  • Joseph Rouse, “Standpoint Theories Reconsidered” Hypatia 24(4) 2009: 200-209.
  • Miriam Solomon, “Standpoint and Creativity”, Hypatia 24(4) 2009: 226-237.

Author Information

T. Bowell
University of Waikato
New Zealand

Feminist Jurisprudence

American feminist jurisprudence is the study of the construction and workings of the law from perspectives which foreground the implications of the law for women and women's lives. This study includes law as a theoretical enterprise as well its practical and concrete effects in women's lives. Further, it includes law as an academic discipline, and thus incorporates concerns regarding pedagogy and the influence of teachers. On all these levels, feminist scholars, lawyers, and activists raise questions about the meaning and the impact of law on women's lives. Feminist jurisprudence seeks to analyze and redress more traditional legal theory and practice. It focuses on the ways in which law has been structured (sometimes unwittingly) that deny the experiences and needs of women. Feminist jurisprudence claims that patriarchy (the system of interconnected relations and institutions that oppress women) infuses the legal system and all its workings, and that this is an unacceptable state of affairs. Consequently, feminist jurisprudence is not politically neutral, but a normative approach, as expressed by philosopher Patricia Smith: "[F]eminist jurisprudence challenges basic legal categories and concepts rather than analyzing them as given. Feminist jurisprudence asks what is implied in traditional categories, distinctions, or concepts and rejects them if they imply the subordination of women. In this sense, feminist jurisprudence is normative and claims that traditional jurisprudence and law are implicitly normative as well" (Smith 1993, p. 10). Feminist jurisprudence sees the workings of law as thoroughly permeated by political and moral judgments about the worth of women and how women should be treated. These judgments are not commensurate with women's understandings of themselves, nor even with traditional liberal conceptions of (moral and legal) equality and fairness.

Although feminist jurisprudence revolves around a number of questions and features a diversity of focus and approach, two characteristics are central to it. First, because the Anglo-American legal tradition is built on liberalism and its tenets, feminist jurisprudence tends to respond to liberalism in some way. The second characteristic is the goal of bringing the law and its practitioners to recognize that law as currently constructed does not acknowledge or respond to the needs of women, and must be changed. These two features can be seen in the major debates in current feminist jurisprudence, which range from questions of the proper perspective from which to understand the problems of the law, to questions of legal theory and practice.

Table of Contents

  1. Responding to Liberalism: Questions of Perspective
  2. Central Concerns: Questions of Theory and Practice
    1. Equality and Rights
    2. Understanding Harm
    3. The Processes of Adjudication
  3. Trajectories
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Responding to Liberalism: Questions of Perspective

As a critical theory, feminist jurisprudence responds to the current dominant understanding of legal thought, which is usually identified with the liberal Anglo-American tradition. (This tradition is represented by such authors as Hart 1961 and Dworkin 1977, 1986.) Two major branches of this tradition have been legal positivism, on the one hand, and natural law theory on the other. Feminist jurisprudence responds to both these branches of the American legal tradition by raising questions regarding their assumptions about the law, including:

  • that law is properly objective and thus must have recourse to objective rules or understandings at some level
  • that law is properly impartial, especially in that it is not to be tainted by the personal experience of any of its practitioners, particularly judges
  • that equality must function as a formal notion rather than a substantive one, such that in the eyes of the law, difference must be shown to be "relevant" in order to be admissible/visible
  • that law, when working properly, should be certain, and that the goal of lawmaking and legal decision-making is to gain certainty
  • that justice can be understood as a matter of procedures, such that a proper following of procedures can be understood as sufficient to rendering justice.

Each of these assumptions, although contested and debated, has remained a significant feature of the liberal tradition of legal understanding.

Feminist jurisprudence usually frames its responses to traditional legal thought in terms of whether or not the critic is maintaining some commitment to the tradition or some particular feature of it. This split in responses has been formulated in a number of different ways, according to the particular concerns they emphasize. The two formulations found most frequently in American feminist jurisprudence characterize the split either as the reformist/radical debate or as the sameness/difference debate. Within the reformist/radical debate, reformist feminists argue that the liberal tradition offers much that can be shaped to fit feminist hands and should be retained for all that it offers. These feminists approach jurisprudence with an eye to what needs to be changed within the system that already exists. Their work, then, is to gain entry into that system and use its own tools to construct a legal system which prevents the inequities of patriarchy from affecting justice.

Those who see the traditional system as either bankrupt or so problematic that it cannot be reshaped are often referred to as transformist or radical feminists. According to this approach, the corruption of the legal tradition by patriarchy is thought to be too deeply embedded to allow for any significant adjustments to the problems that women face. Feminists using this approach tend to argue that the legal system, either parts or as a whole, must be abandoned. They argue that liberal legal concepts, categories and processes must be rejected, and new ones put in place which can be free from the biases of the current system. Their work, then, is to craft the transformations that are necessary in legal theory and practice and to create a new legal system that can provide a more equitable justice.

Under the sameness/difference debate, the central concern for feminists is to understand the role of difference and how women's needs must be figured before the law. Sameness feminists argue that to emphasize the differences between men and women is to weaken women's abilities to gain access to the rights and protections that men have enjoyed. Their concern is that it is women's difference that has been used to keep women from enjoying a legal status equal to men's. Consequently, they see difference as a concept that must be de-emphasized. Sameness feminists work to highlight the ways in which women can be seen as the same as men, entitled to the same rights, protections, and privileges.

Difference feminists argue that (at least some of) the differences between men and women, as well as other types of difference such as race, age, and sexual orientation, are significant. These significant differences must be taken into account by the law in order for justice and equity to be achieved. What has been good law for men cannot simply be adopted by women, because women are not in fact the same as men. Women have different needs which require different legal remedies. The law must be made to recognize differences that are relevant to women's lives, status and possibilities.

The two characterizations of the debate about what perspective is best for understanding the problems of the law do share some features. Those who argue a sameness position are often thought to fit, to some degree, with the reformist view. Difference feminists are seen as sharing much with radicals. The parallel between the two characterizations is that both argue over how much, if any, of the current legal system can and must be preserved and put to use in the service of feminist concerns. The two characterizations are not the same, but the important parallel between them allows for some generalization regarding the ways in which each is likely to respond to particular theoretical and substantive issues. However, while the two may reasonably be grouped for some purposes, they must not be conflated.

From these perspectives, feminist jurisprudence emphasizes two kinds of question: the theoretical and the substantive. These two kinds of question are, perhaps especially for feminists, deeply connected and overlapping. Discussions of central theoretical issues in feminist jurisprudence are punctuated by elaboration of the substantive issues with which they are intertwined.

2. Central Concerns: Questions of Theory and Practice

In asking theoretical questions, feminists are concerned with how to understand the law itself, its proper scope, legitimacy, and meaning. Many of these are the questions of traditional legal theory, but asked in the context of the feminist project: What is the proper moral foundation of the law, especially given that any answer depends on the moral principles of the dominant structure of the society? What is the meaning of rule of law, especially given that obedience to law has been an important part of the history of subjugation? What is the meaning of equality, especially in a world of diversity? What is the meaning of harm, especially in a world in which women, not men, are subjected by men to certain kinds of violence? How can adjudication of conflict be properly and fairly achieved, especially when not all persons are able to come to the adjudication process on a "level playing field"? What is the meaning of property, and how can women avoid being categorized as property? Is law the best and most appropriate channel for the resolution of conflict, especially given its traditional grounding in patriarchal goals and structures?

Although feminists have addressed all these questions and more, perhaps one issue stands out in many feminists' eyes as a matter of special importance, encompassing as it does some aspect of many of the questions noted above. The issue that for many feminists is at the heart of concerns is that of equality and rights. Two others that may be considered nearly as central are problems of harm, and of the processes of adjudication.

a. Equality and Rights

Law works partly by drawing abstract guiding principles out of the specifics of the cases it adjudicates. On this abstract level, theoretical questions arise for feminist jurisprudence regarding equality and rights, including the following: what understanding of equality will make it possible for women to have control over their lives, in both the private and public spheres? What understanding of equality will provide an adequate grounding for the concept of rights, such that women's rights can protect both their individual liberty and their identity as women?

In general, the feminist concern with equality involves the claim that equality must be understood not simply as a formal concept that functions rhetorically and legally. Equality must be a substantive concept which can actually make changes in the power structure and the relative power positions of men and women generally. Although equality is examined in a wide variety of specific applications, the major concern is the goal of making equality meaningful in the lives of women. But for many feminists, concerns with equality cannot be addressed without also attending to rights. Because the liberal tradition figures rights as the hallmark of equality, it is in terms of rights that we are expected to see ourselves as equals before the law. Further, rights discourse has structured both our understanding of equality, and our claims to it.

Examinations of equality are, therefore, often framed by particular substantive issues. For example, much feminist jurisprudence regarding equality is framed in terms of concerns about work. If women are equal, then how will this be expressed in workplace law and policy? One of the key issues in this field has been how to treat pregnancy in the workplace: Is it fair for women to have extended or paid leave for pregnancy and birthing? Under what circumstances, or limitations? Are women being given "special" rights if they have a right to such leave? The struggle over the proper understanding of pregnancy and work raises questions about whether women should be treated in such law as individuals or as a class. As individuals, it has seemed relatively easy for workplaces to claim that not all employees are given such leave, and thus that women who do not are being treated "equally". One feminist strategy has been to attempt to revise such law to recognize the particular difference of women as a class. Herma Hill Kay, for example, argues that pregnancy can be seen as an episode which affects women's ability to take advantage of opportunities in the workplace, and that pregnant workers must be protected against loss of equal opportunity during episodes of pregnancy. (Kay, 1985)

Concerns over pregnancy express the fundamental questions of the sameness/difference debate. The sameness position suggests difference should be erased to the greatest extent possible, because it has been used as a basis for discrimination. Difference proponents argue that pregnancy involves significant differences which should be seen as a linchpin of legal understanding. Does equality mean that women should wish to be treated exactly the same as men, or does it mean that women should wish to be treated differently, because their differences are such that same treatment cannot provide equity?

Feminists who argue that equality requires creating for women the same opportunities and rights which are currently available to men of the ruling class are bringing the reformist or sameness approach to bear. Approaches to rights and equality which focus on women's individuality, emphasizing it in the way that law has done for men and requiring women to show that they are like men and thus may be treated like men, tend then to be reformist or sameness oriented. Because these approaches are seen as requiring that women become as much like men as possible, and that law treat women as it does men, they are often referred to as assimilationist.

Christine Littleton (Littleton, 1987) offers a further set of terms for approaches to understanding equality: symmetrical (paralleling reformist and sameness approaches) and asymmetrical (paralleling radical and difference approaches). This classification refers to how women and men are "located in society" with regard to issues, norms and rules. If a theorist sees men and women as sharing a location regarding an issue, then that theorist has a symmetrical approach; if not, then the approach is asymmetrical. Littleton classifies assimilationist approaches as symmetrical, along with what she calls the androgyny approach. The androgyny approach argues that men and women are very much alike, but that equality will require social institutions to pick a "mean" between the two, and apply that standard to all persons. This model is less frequently argued than the assimilation model.

There are also many radical and difference approaches to equality. What they share is the desire to avoid having to take on all that is questionable and/or undesirable about (society's construction of) men in order to be considered equal before the law. Thus many radical approaches (although not all - MacKinnon, below, is an example of one which is not) emphasize similar questions and problems as difference approaches. How to recognize relevant difference, and what kind of difference law must be responsive to, is a crucial part of these feminist examinations of equality. Ann Scales, for example, argues that liberal/reformist approaches do not do enough to really make the changes that are necessary, because the problem in equality is a problem of understanding how domination works. We must learn to see how equality has formally been tied in to domination through the liberal framework. In her view, a certain kind of inequality needs to be recognized and worked with, rather than ignored or assimilated. (Scales, 1986)

Other difference/radical approaches include the special rights, accommodation, acceptance, and empowerment models. (Littleton, 1987) The special rights model suggests that justice requires our recognizing that equality is too easily understood as "sameness", where men and women are not the same. Rights should be based on needs, and if women have needs that men do not, that should not limit their rights. The accommodation model asserts that differences which are not fundamental or biologically based should be treated under a symmetrical or assimilation model. But this leaves those differences which are fundamental (such as the ability to be pregnant) as differences which must be recognized in the law and accommodated by it.

Littleton's own approach is expressed in the acceptance model. This argues that (gender) difference must be accepted, and that law should focus on the consequences of such differences, rather than the differences themselves. Although differences exist between men and women, equality should function to make these differences "costless" relative to each other. Equality should function to prevent women's being penalized on the basis of their difference. Thus equality should require us to institute paid leave for pregnancy and birthing, and to guarantee women's return to their jobs after birthing.

Empowerment models reject difference as irrelevant, and shift focus to levels of empowerment. Equality, then, is understood as what balances power for groups and individuals, and dismantles the ability of some to dominate others. This radical and asymmetrical view does not, however, fit well with the categorization of feminist positions in terms of sameness and difference. The empowerment model's focus on domination and the ways in which power is distributed seems to represent a significant departure from the parallel suggested above. Thus some feminist jurists have suggested that it be understood as a separate approach. Judith Baer calls it simply the domination model of feminist jurisprudence. Catherine MacKinnon is one well-known scholar who holds this view. (MacKinnon, 1987) In her theorizing of pornography, for example, she focuses on the question of how power is used in pornography to maintain a structure of domination which belies the possibility of equality between men and women.

Feminist critiques of rights in general assert that rights have been apportioned based on notions of equality that deliberately exclude the needs of women. If rights are to be truly equal, they must be apportioned on a more equitable basis, informed by the experience of women and others previously excluded. Or, following MacKinnon or Patricia Williams (discussed below), rights must be apportioned based on how they empower those to whom they are granted. Feminist scholars debate the ground for understanding rights while working to create a foundation from which women can claim and exercise rights that will be meaningful in their lives.

b. Understanding Harm

Perhaps the most difficult question for feminist jurisprudence regarding the issue of harm is that of perspective: who defines and identifies harm in specific cases? Given that law has traditionally worked from a patriarchal perspective, it is perhaps not surprising that identifying harm to women has been problematic. A patriarchal system will benefit from a very stingy recognition of harms against women. Feminist jurisprudence, therefore, must examine the basic question, what is harm? It also must ask, what counts as harm in our legal system, and why? What has been excluded from definitions of harm that women need included, and how can such trends be overturned?

Three types of harm-causing actions that are typically and systematically directed against women have formed the background for discussion about what harm means, and what counts as harm: rape, sexual harassment, and battering. Until fairly recently (for example, before the legislative reform movements of the 1970s), some forms of these actions were not considered actionable offenses under the law. This was largely due to the history of understanding women not as independent and autonomous agents, but as property belonging to men (thus issues of the meaning of property are also crucial to understanding harm). Feminist jurisprudence has challenged this state of affairs. As a result, changes have been made in the laws regarding each of the three categories, although the effectiveness of these changes is widely disputed (see, e.g., Schulhofer 1998 for an excellent review of this law). At the very least, work by feminists has made it possible to speak of these harms by providing a vocabulary for them, by raising awareness about them, and by prosecuting them more frequently and with some success.

Discussions of rape attempt to answer many of the questions that apply to all three types of harm-causing actions. Cases of all three types give rise to similar problems that prevent women from being treated justly: blaming the victim; privileging the point of view of "the" agent, i.e., the male perpetrator; indicting the woman's sexual history while ignoring the man's history, whether sexual or violent. Underlying all these problems are assumptions about gender and agency which encourage the law to place responsibility for their own harm on women rather than on the men who cause it. Women have been believed to be mentally unstable or at least weak-minded, to be scheming and deceptive, and to have an improper motivation for making claims of harm against men. For these reasons, they tend to be seen as untrustworthy witnesses. Because they have been characterized as sexually insatiable and indiscriminate, they tend to be seen as deserving whatever harm they "provoke" from men. Corresponding assumptions about men's rational superiority encourage their being seen as believable witnesses. At the same time, assumptions about men's natural sexual needs are taken as justification for their violations of women. Feminist jurisprudence attempts to respond to these problems as double standards and matters of equality and rights.

Other issues of harm require different responses. Harm-causing actions tend to be defined in terms of external and observable characteristics (levels of force), of intention on the part of the agent (mens rea), and of the consent of the one harmed. Consequently, what is at issue is how law uses these criteria in determining both when harm has occurred and whether it is to be justified or excused. What feminist jurisprudence has found is that women and men frequently differ over the understanding of each of these criteria. But since it is a patriarchal understanding which grounds the law, women's understandings tend not to be given a proper hearing.

In Susan Estrich's discussion of rape (Estrich, 1987, 1987a), she claims that the mens rea criterion can be used to create either too much emphasis on the perpetrator's intention, or too little. In either case, she believes the focus on this criterion makes evident the law's lack of understanding of and concern for the harms women suffer. The law's focus is to not wrongly punish men, which is achieved at the cost of not protecting women.

Further, Estrich argues that the force criterion is understood from a patriarchal perspective: force is seen as a matter of what "boys do in schoolyards." This criterion figures force as a simple matter of the straightforward use of physical strength, or the use of implements of violence. But it ignores the kinds of force that are most frequently used in rape and other types of harm to women, such as psychological coercion. If the courts expect women to resist physical and psychological coercion in the same ways and at the same level that men do, then the courts impose an unreasonable expectation on the "reasonable" woman.

Regarding consent, Estrich explains that the courts have believed that if consent is given, then rape (or other harms) do not occur. This places responsibility on the one who has been harmed to show that she did not, in fact, consent. But patriarchal courts have held that only the strongest and most emphatic expression of non-consent functions as evidence. This means that in many cases, women have been said to have "consented" even though they were physically carried off by men and verbally expressed non-consent (Schulhofer 1998). Non-consent has not been easily proven unless the woman has been severely beaten, or unless a significant weapon (that is, gun or knife) was used, or death was threatened in a way that convinces the court. Thus what non-consent means for the court has been very different from what women themselves have said about (their) consent.

Robin West (West, 1988) argues along similar lines, claiming that women's social training does not impart the same fundamental values that men's training does. She theorizes that men value separation and autonomy to the point that they would physically fight, desperately, to maintain theirs. But because women value connection and relation most highly, they find it difficult to respond to physical violence with violence of their own. Violence destroys connection and relationship, which is what women are socialized to value most. This makes it difficult for women to respond to rape, and other harms, in a way which convinces masculine courts that they did not consent. Women's definition and identification of these harms is very different from what the courts have so far constructed.

It is difficult to separate out some parts of the reformist or sameness and radical or difference approaches with regard to harm. In general, however, those who argue that current laws can be changed to adequately protect women have reformist or sameness views. Those arguing that the current definitions of harm simply cannot be revised sufficiently have radical or difference views. Thus Estrich, who concludes that we need to treat rape as we treat other kinds of crime which require nonconsent (theft, for example) could be considered a reformist view. Mary Lou Fellows and Bev Balos offer a similar analysis of how women's perception of the harms of date rape can be accommodated in current law. This can be accomplished by the application of the heightened duty of care that exists already in the common law doctrine of confidential relationship. (Fellows and Balos, 1991) West's argument, based on recognizing and responding to fundamental differences between men and women regarding harm, could be seen as a radical or difference view. MacKinnon's analysis of sexual harassment, which focuses on the need for women to be empowered to define the harms against them, represents a dominance view on harms.

c. The Processes of Adjudication

Many feminist jurists challenge the processes of adjudication by raising questions about the neutrality or impartiality that such processes are assumed to embody. Neutrality is believed to function in the law in at least two ways. It is assumed to be built into the processes of the law, and it is assumed to be produced by those processes. Feminist jurisprudence challenges the first set of assumptions by raising questions about legal reasoning. It challenges the second by raising questions about how a law created and applied by partial and biased persons can itself be neutral. Thus feminist jurisprudence also raises the question of whether neutrality is a possible, or an appropriate, goal of the law.

As traditionally understood, neutrality in law is supposed to protect us from a number of ills. It protects from personal bias by insisting that judges, attorneys, law enforcement officers, etc., treat us not as people with specific characteristics, but as interchangeable subjects. We should be seen only in terms of certain specific actions and our intentions with regard to those specific actions. Officials are expected not to bring their personal biases to bear on those who come before them, and certain personal aspects of those brought before the law are not permitted to come under scrutiny. For example, if a judge personally believes that women are pathological liars, this is not supposed to influence his or her interpretation of any particular woman's testimony. Similarly, no person's race is supposed to influence any judge's understanding of their case. Feminist jurisprudence challenges such claims to neutrality.

Neutrality in law is supposed to protect against ideological bias as well. It does this by taking a supposedly universal perspective on a case, rather than a particular perspective. This belief that law and its practitioners can see, and judge, from the "view from nowhere" has been criticized by feminist jurisprudence. Feminists claim that such complete objectivity seems not to be fully possible. They also argue that claiming such neutrality deflects attention away from the fact that a partial view - a masculinist view - is being presented as universal. Feminist jurisprudence, like most feminist theory, rejects the claim of law that it is a neutral practice, and instead points to the ways in which law is clearly not neutral.

One of the ways law is not neutral is through the individual people that work in law. Feminist jurisprudence argues that because there is no such thing as the "view from nowhere", every understanding has a perspective. This perspective influences it, and provides an interpretive field for whatever matters of fact there may be. Since law is made, administered and enforced by people, and people must have a perspective, law must reflect those perspectives at least to some degree. Feminists tend to agree that to the extent that a practice or person is unaware of their own perspective, that perspective will more strongly influence their interpretations of the world. It is when we become aware of biases that we are able, through critical reflection, to reduce their influence and thus move toward a greater (although not a perfect) objectivity.

Another way that law is not neutral is in its content. Because it is made by people, many of whom have not critically examined their own standpoints, the content of law may be unfair or discriminatory. Such content would require officials to act in ways that are not impartial, or not fair. But even if law is written by those whose perspectives are relatively objective, our legislative system often imposes compromises on laws. Some compromises required to pass law may change or weaken its objectives in ways that prevent its functioning as intended. These criticisms show that the content of the law, affected by the contestations of our legislative system, may not be neutral. Further, it shows that the processes of the law do not guarantee the neutrality that they are assumed to do.

Neutrality is also assumed to be built into certain processes of the law, and in particular the processes of judicial reasoning. The traditional model of judicial decision-making relies on case law, which uses precedent and analogy to provide evidence and justification. Interpretation of statutes in prior cases provides precedent or rules. Courts then attempt to determine how the facts of current cases require one rule or another to be brought to bear. This way of making decisions has itself been thought to be neutral, and the formalities of due process that support it are thought to reinforce that neutrality. This feature of law, relying on past judgments to influence current and future ones, also makes it peculiarly resistant to change. For feminist jurisprudence, use of precedent allows the law to insulate itself against the critiques of outsiders, including women.

Use of precedent has been challenged by a feminist and non-feminist critiques, including the pragmatism of Margaret Radin (Radin, 1990) and Jerome Frank's legal realism (Frank, 1963). Feminist jurisprudence responds to use of precedent by pointing out those areas which are most likely to be subject to sexist understandings. For example, case law that has derived from cases in which plaintiffs and defendants are men will assume that the circumstances for those men are simply the "normal" circumstances. Workplace law has frequently been challenged by feminist critics for this reason. The law assumes, based on cases in which the workplace was populated mainly by men, that everyone who works shares men's circumstances. This assumption entails that workers are supported by a full-time homemaker, such that the burdens of home life and child rearing should not affect one's ability to function efficiently in the workplace. But such assumptions work against women, who usually are supporting someone else in this way rather than being supported.

Reform and sameness feminists argue that case law is not a bad system but that reforms are needed to emphasize to the realities of women's lives. Radical and difference feminists are more likely to argue that case law is itself a system that is too heavily entrenched in patriarchy to be maintained. Its reliance on precedent makes it too conservative a system of decision-making to be adequately brought to the service of feminism.

3. Trajectories

Although it seems that the sameness/difference and the reform/radical debates could create an impasse for feminists, some theorists believe that some combination of the two views can be more effective than either alone. Patricia Williams (Williams, 1991), for example, believes that rights can function as powerful liberatory tools for the traditionally disadvantaged. However, she also believes that in a racist society such as contemporary America, racial difference must be recognized because it creates disadvantage before the law. In this way, she claims that some features of the liberal tradition, like rights, need to be maintained for the liberatory work they can do. However, she argues that the liberal tradition of formal equality is damaging to historically marginalized groups. This aspect of law needs to be completely transformed.

As an example of the ways in which rights are still needed by the traditionally disadvantaged, she examines the relationship to rights that is enjoyed by a white male colleague. His sense of his rights is so entrenched that he sees them as creating distance between himself and others, and believes that rights should be played down. In contrast, Williams expresses her own relationship to rights, being a black woman, as much more tenuous. The history of American slavery, under which black Americans were literally owned by whites, makes it difficult for both blacks and whites to figure blacks as empowered by rights in the same ways that whites are.

This example shows how Williams weaves together important elements of both reform and radical positions, and at the same time includes the element of empowerment that is seen in dominance positions. She claims that for blacks, and for any traditionally disadvantaged group, rights are a significant part of a program of advancement. One's relationship to rights depends on who one is, and how one is empowered by one's society and law. For those whose rights are already guaranteed, what may be necessary for social change is to challenge the power of rights rhetoric for one's group. But for those whose rights have never been secure, this will not look like the best course of action. Williams' suggestion is that we recognize that rights and rights rhetoric function differently in different settings and for different people. But this, then, is a response which relies on the radical and difference premise that difference must in fact be attended to rather than elided. In order that rights be made effective for historically marginalized people, we must first see that they do not in fact function for all people in the way that they do for those they were created for.

Another approach to drawing the two sides of the debate in feminist jurisprudence together is offered by Judith Baer, whose claim is that feminist jurisprudence to date has failed to either reform or transform law because feminists in both camps have made crucial mistakes. (Baer, 1999) The primary error has been that feminist jurisprudence has tended to misunderstand the tradition it criticizes. Although feminist jurists recognize that the liberal tradition has secured rights for men but not women, they have failed to make explicit the corresponding asymmetry of responsibility. Women are accorded responsibility for themselves and others in ways that men are not. For example, women are expected to be responsible for the lives of children in ways that men are not; as noted above, this has implications in areas like workplace law.

The second major error Baer sees in feminist jurisprudence is that it, along with most feminism, has tended to focus almost exclusively on women. This has drawn feminist attention away from men and the institutions that feminism needs to study, criticize, challenge and change. It has also created a series of debates within feminism that are divisive and draining of feminist energy. Again, the solution is to recognize when reform (sameness) and radical (difference) approaches are effective, and to use each as appropriate. Baer argues that

[f]eminist jurists need not - indeed, we must not – choose between laws that treat men and women the same and laws that treat them differently. We already know that both kinds of law can be sexist. Our gender-neutral law of reproductive rights treats women worse than men, but so did "protective" labor legislation. Conversely, both gender-neutral and gender-specific laws can promote sexual equality. Comparable worth legislation would make women more nearly equal with men. So have affirmative action policies. Women can have it both ways. Law can treat men and women alike where they are alike and differently where they are different. (Baer 1999, 55)

Baer provides critiques of both reform and radical feminist jurisprudence. She concludes that neither alone is sufficient, but that both, applied where appropriate, could be. She argues that the feminist focus on women has encouraged an inability to think on a universal scale. This leaves feminists, and law under feminist jurisprudence, mired in the particularities of individual cases and individual traits. To move out of this mire, she suggests three tasks for feminist jurisprudence:

First, it must do the opposite of what conventional theory and feminist critiques have done: posit rights and question responsibility. Second, it must develop analyses that will separate situations from the people experiencing them, so we can talk about women's victimization without labeling them as victims. Finally, it must move beyond women and begin scrutinizing men and institutions. (Baer 1999, 68)

Baer does not suggest that feminism, nor feminist jurisprudence, should give up the study of women and women's situations. Rather, her suggestion is that this study as an exclusive focus is not sufficient for either reform or transformation. Because "women neither create nor sustain their position in society" feminists need to scrutinize those who do. Baer's suggestion is that what is needed is an account of "what it means to be a human being, a man, or a woman, which makes equality possible." (Baer 1999, 192) The mistakes that feminist jurisprudence has made have prevented its developing this account, which Baer thinks could be the foundation of what she calls a feminist postliberalism sufficient for feminist jurisprudence.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Baer, Judith A, Our Lives Before the Law: Constructing a Feminist Jurisprudence (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1999)
  • Cornell, Drucilla, Beyond Accommodation: Ethical Feminism, Deconstruction and the Law (New York: Routledge, 1990)
  • Dworkin, Andrea, Intercourse, (New York: The Free Press, 1987)
  • Dworkin, Ronald, Law's Empire (Cambridge: Harvaard University Press, 1986)
  • Dworkin, Ronald, Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • Estrich, Susan, "Rape," 95 Yale Law Journal 1087-1184 (1987)
  • Estrich, Susan, Real Rape (Cambrdige: Harvard University Press, 1987a)
  • Fellows, Mary Louise and Beverly Balos, "Guilty of the Crime of Trust: Nonstranger Rape" 75 Minnesota Law Review 599 (1991)
  • Hart, H.L.A., The Concept of Law, (New York, Oxford University Press, 1961)
  • Jerome, Frank, Law and the Modern Mind (New York: Doubleday and Co., 1963)
  • Kay, Herma Hill, "Equality and Difference: The Case of Pregnancy," 1 Berkeley Women's Law Journal 1-37 (1985)
  • Littleton, Christine A., "Reconstructing Sexual Equality," 75 California Law Review 1279-1337 (1987)
  • MacKinnon, Catherine, Feminism Unmodified: Discourses on Life and Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987)
  • Minow, Martha, Making All the Difference: Inclusion, Exclusion and American Law (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991)
  • Radin, Margaret Jane, "The Pragmatist and the Feminist," 63 Southern California Law Review, 1699 (1990)
  • Scales, Ann C., "The Emergence of Feminist Jurisprudence: An Essay," 95 Yale Law Journal 1373-1403 (1986)
  • Schulhofer, Stephen J., Unwanted Sex: The Culture of Intimidation and the Failure of Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998)
  • Smith, Patricia, ed., Feminist Jurisprudence (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993)
  • Tong, Rosemarie, Women, Sex and the Law (Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Littlefield, 1984)
  • West, Robin, "Jurisprudence and Gender," 55 University of Chicago Law Review 1 (1988)
  • Williams, Patricia, The Alchemy of Race and Rights (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1991)

Author Information

Melissa Burchard
University of North Carolina – Asheville
U. S. A.

Michel Foucault: Feminism

Poststructuralism and contemporary feminism have emerged as two of the most influential political and cultural movements of the late twentieth century. The recent alliance between them has been marked by an especially lively engagement with the work of French philosopher Michel Foucault. Although Foucault makes few references to women or to the issue of gender in his writings, his treatment of the relations between power, the body and sexuality has stimulated extensive feminist interest. Foucault’s idea that the body and sexuality are cultural constructs rather than natural phenomena has made a significant contribution to the feminist critique of essentialism. While feminists have found Foucault’s analysis of the relations between power and the body illuminating, they have also drawn attention to its limitations. From the perspective of a feminist politics that aims to promote women’s autonomy, the tendency of a Foucauldian account of power to reduce social agents to docile bodies seems problematic. Although many feminist theorists remain critical of Foucault’s questioning of the categories of the subject and agency on the grounds that such questioning undermines the emancipatory aims of feminism, others have argued that in his late work he develops a more robust account of subjectivity and resistance which, while not without its problems from a feminist perspective, nevertheless has a lot to offer a feminist politics. The affinities and tensions between Foucault’s thought and contemporary feminism are discussed below.

Table of Contents

  1. Background: Foucault's Genealogy of Power, Knowledge and the Subject
  2. Between Foucault and Feminism: Convergence and Critique
  3. Power, the Body and Sexuality
  4. Subjectivity, Identity and Resistance
  5. Freedom, Power and Politics
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Background: Foucault's Genealogy of Power, Knowledge and the Subject

In the works of his middle years - Discipline and Punish and The History of Sexuality, Vol. 1 - Foucault traces the emergence of some of the practices, concepts, forms of knowledge, social institutions and techniques of government which have contributed to shaping modern European culture. He calls the method of historical analysis he employs 'genealogical'. Genealogy is a form of critical history in the sense that it attempts a diagnosis of 'the present time, and of what we are, in this very moment' in order 'to question … what is postulated as self-evident … to dissipate what is familiar and accepted' (Foucault 1988a: 265). What distinguishes genealogical analysis from traditional historiography is that it is 'a form of history which can account for the constitution of knowledges, discourses, domains of objects etc. without having to make reference to a subject which is either transcendental in relation to the field of events or runs in its empty sameness throughout history' (Foucault 1980: 149). Rather than assuming that the movement of history can be explained by the intentions and aims of individual actors, genealogy investigates the complex and shifting network of relations between power, knowledge and the body which produce historically specific forms of subjectivity. Foucault links his genealogical studies to a modality of social critique which he describes as a 'critical ontology of the present'. In a late paper, he explains that an ontology of the present involves 'an analysis of the historical limits that are imposed on us' in order to create the space for 'an experiment with the possibility of going beyond them’ (Foucault 1984: 50). Thus, genealogy is a form of social critique that seeks to determine possibilities for social change and ethical transformation of ourselves.

One of the central threads of Foucault's genealogy of the present is an analysis of the transformations in the nature and functioning of power which mark the transition to modern society. Foucault's genealogy of modern power challenges the commonly held assumption that power is an essentially negative, repressive force that operates purely through the mechanisms of law, taboo and censorship. According to Foucault, this 'juridico-discursive' conception of power (Foucault 1978: 82) has its origins in the practices of power characteristic of pre-modern societies. In such societies, he claims, power was centralized and coordinated by a sovereign authority who exercised absolute control over the population through the threat or open display of violence. From the seventeenth century onwards, however, as the growth and care of populations increasingly became the primary concerns of the state, new mechanisms of power emerged which centered around the administration and management of 'life'. In the complex story that Foucault tells, this new form of 'bio-power' coalesced around two poles. One pole is concerned with the efficient government of the population as a whole and focuses on the management of the life processes of the social body. It involves the regulation of phenomena such as birth, death, sickness, disease, health, sexual relations and so on. The other pole, which Foucault labels 'disciplinary power', targets the human body as an object to be manipulated and trained. In Discipline and Punish Foucault studies the practices of discipline and training associated with disciplinary power. He suggests that these practices were first cultivated in isolated institutional settings such as prisons, military establishments, hospitals, factories and schools but were gradually applied more broadly as techniques of social regulation and control. The key feature of disciplinary power is that it is exercised directly on the body. Disciplinary practices subject bodily activities to a process of constant surveillance and examination that enables a continuous and pervasive control of individual conduct. The aim of these practices is to simultaneously optimize the body's capacities, skills and productivity and to foster its usefulness and docility: 'What was then being formed was a policy of coercions that act on the body, a calculated manipulation of its elements, its gestures, its behavior. The human body was entering a machinery of power that explores it, breaks it down and rearranges it…Thus, discipline produces subjected and practiced bodies, "docile" bodies' (Foucault 1977: 138-9). It is not, however, only the body that disciplinary techniques target. Foucault presents disciplinary power as productive of certain types of subject as well. In Discipline and Punish he describes the way in which the central technique of disciplinary power - constant surveillance - which is initially directed toward disciplining the body, takes hold of the mind as well to induce a psychological state of 'conscious and permanent visibility' (Foucault 1977: 201). In other words, perpetual surveillance is internalized by individuals to produce the kind of self-awareness that defines the modern subject. With the idea that modern power operates to produce the phenomena it targets Foucault challenges the juridical notion of power as law which assumes that power is simply the constraint or repression of something that is already constituted. On Foucault's account the transition to modernity entails the replacement of the law by the norm as the primary instrument of social control. Foucault links the importance assumed by norms in modern society to the development of the human or social sciences. In the first volume of The History of Sexuality he describes how, in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, sex and sexuality became crucial political issues in a society concerned with managing and directing the life of individuals and of populations. On Foucault's account, the spread of bio-power is intimately connected to the social science discourses on sex and sexuality which proliferated during this period. These discourses, he claims, tended to understand sex as an instinctual biological and psychic drive with deep links to identity and, thus, with potentially far-reaching effects on the sexual and social behavior of individuals. The idea that the sexual drive could function in a normal, healthy manner or could be warped and perverted into pathological forms led to a project of classification of behavior along a scale of normalization and pathologization of the sexual instinct (Dreyfus & Rabinow 1982: 173). Once the social (and sexual) science categories of normalcy and deviancy were established, various political technologies aimed at treating and reforming 'deviant' behavior could be sanctioned as in the interests of both the individual and society. Thus, Foucault suggests that in modern society the behavior of individuals and groups is increasingly pervasively controlled through standards of normality which are disseminated by a range of assessing, diagnostic, prognostic and normative knowledges such as criminology, medicine, psychology and psychiatry. Modern individuals, moreover, become the agents of their own 'normalization' to the extent that they are subjected to, and become invested in, the categories, classifications and norms propagated by scientific and administrative discourses which purport to reveal the 'truth' of their identities. Modern disciplinary society can, therefore, dispense with direct forms of repression and constraint because social control is achieved by means of subtler strategies of normalization, strategies which produce self-regulating, 'normalized' individuals. It is Foucault's insight into the productivity of the practices and technologies characteristic of normalizing bio-power that underpins his general conclusion that power in modern societies is a fundamentally creative rather than repressive force (Foucault 1977: 194). Above all, Foucault claims that modern regimes of power operate to produce us as subjects who are both the objects and vehicles of power. He explains that: 'The individual is not to be conceived as a sort of elementary nucleus, a primitive atom, a multiple and inert material on which power comes to fasten or against which it happens to strike, and in so doing subdues or crushes individuals. In fact, it is already one of the prime effects of power that certain bodies, certain gestures, certain discourses, certain desires, come to be identified and constituted as individuals. The individual, that is, is not the vis-à-vis of power; it is … one of its prime effects.' (Foucault 1980: 98). Foucault's analysis of productive bio-power points to a complex interaction between modern forms of power and knowledge: 'the exercise of power perpetually creates knowledge and, conversely, knowledge constantly induces effects of power' (Foucault 1980: 52). For Foucault, power can be said to create knowledge in two related senses. Firstly, in the sense that particular institutions of power make certain forms of knowledge historically possible. In the case of the social sciences, for example, it is the refinement of disciplinary techniques for observing and analyzing the body in various institutional settings that facilitates the expansion of new areas of social research. Power can also be said to create knowledge in the sense that institutions of power determine the conditions under which scientific statements come to be counted as true or false (Hacking 1986). According to Foucault, then, 'truth is a thing of this world: it is produced only by virtue of multiple forms of constraint. And it induces regular effects of power' (Foucault 1980: 131). This description suggests that the production of 'truth' is never entirely separable from technologies of power. On the other hand, Foucault maintains that knowledge induces effects of power in so far as it constitutes new objects of inquiry - 'objects' like 'the delinquent', ‘the homosexual’ or ‘the criminal type’ - which then become available for manipulation and control (Rouse 1994: 97). For example, he claims that it is the knowledge generated by the human sciences which enables modern power to circulate through finer channels, 'gaining access to individuals themselves, to their bodies, their gestures, and all their daily actions' (Foucault 1980: 151). It is in order to signal the mutually conditioning operations of power and knowledge that Foucault speaks of regimes of 'power/knowledge' or ‘discourses’; that is, structured ways of knowing and exercising power.

2. Between Foucault and Feminism: Convergence and Critique

From the perspective of contemporary social and political theory, the originality of Foucault's genealogies of power/knowledge resides in the challenge they pose to traditional ways of thinking about power. It is this challenge that has made Foucault's work both a significant resource for feminist theory and generated heated debate amongst feminist social and political theorists. While there is broad agreement that Foucault's redefinition of how we think about power in contemporary societies contains important insights for feminism, feminists remain divided over the implications of this redefinition for feminist theory and practice.

An analysis of power relations is central to the feminist project of understanding the nature and causes of women's subordination. Drawing on the traditional model of power as repression, many types of feminist theory have assumed that the oppression of women can be explained by patriarchal social structures which secure the power of men over women. Increasingly, however, this assumption is being called into question by other feminists who are concerned to counter what they regard as the oversimplified conception of power relations this view entails, as well as its problematic implication that women are simply the passive, powerless victims of male power. In the context of this debate, Foucault's work on power has been used by some feminists to develop a more complex analysis of the relations between gender and power which avoids the assumption that the oppression of women is caused in any simple way by men's possession of power. On the basis of Foucault's understanding of power as exercised rather than possessed, as circulating throughout the social body rather than emanating from the top down, and as productive rather than repressive (Sawicki 1988: 164), feminists have sought to challenge accounts of gender relations which emphasize domination and victimization so as to move towards a more textured understanding of the role of power in women's lives. Foucault’s redefinition of power has made a significant and varied contribution to this project. Foucault's notion that power is constitutive of that upon which it acts has enabled feminists to explore the often complicated ways in which women's experiences, self-understandings, comportment and capacities are constructed in and by the power relations which they are seeking to transform. The idea that modern power is involved in producing rather than simply repressing individuals has also played a part in a controversial move within feminism away from traditional liberationist political orientations. Eschewing a liberationist political program which aims for total emancipation from power, Foucauldian-influenced feminism concentrates on exposing the localized forms that gender power relations take at the micro-political level in order to determine concrete possibilities for resistance and social change. In pursuing this project, feminist scholars have drawn on Foucault's analysis of the productive dimension of disciplinary power which is exercised outside of the narrowly defined political realm in order to examine the workings of power in women's everyday lives. Some feminists have also found Foucault’s contention that the body is the principal site of power in modern society useful in their explorations of the social control of women through their bodies and sexuality. Finally, feminists have taken up Foucault's analytic of power/knowledge, with its emphasis on the criteria by which claims to knowledge are legitimated, in order to develop a theory which avoids generalizing from the experiences of Western, white, heterosexual, middle-class feminisms. Drawing on Foucault's questioning of fixed essences and his relativist notion of truth, feminists have sought to create a theoretical space for the articulation of hitherto marginalized subject positions, political perspectives and interests. While there is considerable overlap between Foucault's analytic of power/knowledge and feminist concerns, his work has also been subject to strong criticism by feminists. This more critical body of work takes issue with precisely those aspects of Foucault's conception of power that Foucauldian feminists have found useful. The most commonly cited feminist objections center around two issues: his view of subjectivity as constructed by power and his failure to outline the norms which inform his critical enterprise. Nancy Fraser argues that the problem with Foucault's claim that forms of subjectivity are constituted by relations of power is that it leaves no room for resistance to power. If individuals are simply the effects of power, mere 'docile bodies' shaped by power, then it becomes difficult to explain who resists power. Thus, Fraser finds Foucault's assertion that power always generates resistance incoherent. She argues, moreover, that Foucault's refusal to articulate independently justified norms which would enable him to distinguish acceptable from unacceptable forms of power means that he cannot answer crucial questions about why domination ought to be resisted. According to Fraser, 'only with the introduction of normative notions could he begin to tell us what is wrong with the modern power/knowledge regime and why we ought to oppose it' (Fraser 1989: 29). In Fraser’s view, Foucault’s normatively neutral stance on power limits the value of his work for feminism because it fails to provide the normative resources required to criticize structures of domination and to guide programs for social change. Echoing and extending Fraser's criticisms, Nancy Hartsock contends that Foucault’s questioning of the categories of subjectivity and agency should be treated with suspicion by feminists. She asks: 'Why is it that just at the moment when so many of us who have been silenced begin to demand the right to name ourselves, to act as subjects rather than objects of history, that just then the concept of subjecthood becomes problematic?' (Hartsock 1990: 164). Like Fraser, Hartsock finds Foucault’s conception of modern power problematic in so far as it reduces individuals to 'docile bodies' rather than subjects with the capacity to resist power. She claims that Foucault's understanding of the subject as an effect of power threatens the viability of a feminist politics because it denies the liberatory subject and, thus, condemns women to perpetual oppression. Hartsock argues, moreover, that Foucault's rejection of the Enlightenment belief that truth is intrinsically opposed to power (and, therefore, inevitably plays a liberating role) undermines the emancipatory political aims of feminism. By insisting on the mutually conditioning operations of knowledge and power, Hartsock contends that Foucault denies the possibility of liberatory knowledge; that is, he denies the possibility that increased and better knowledge of patriarchal power can lead to liberation from oppression. For this reason she believes that his work is incompatible with the fundamentally emancipatory political orientation of feminism. These criticisms of Foucault are directed at the conception of the subject and power developed in his middle years. Some feminists have argued, however, that in his late work Foucault modifies his theoretical perspective in ways that make it more useful to the project of articulating a coherent feminist ethics and politics. Feminist responses to Foucault's late work are discussed in the final section.

3. Power, the Body and Sexuality

There are a number of aspects of Foucault's analysis of the relations between power, the body and sexuality that have stimulated feminist interest. Firstly, Foucault's analyses of the productive dimensions of disciplinary powers which is exercised outside the narrowly defined political domain overlap with the feminist project of exploring the micropolitics of personal life and exposing the mechanics of patriarchal power at the most intimate levels of women's experience. Secondly, Foucault’s treatment of power and its relation to the body and sexuality has provided feminist social and political theorists with some useful conceptual tools for the analysis of the social construction of gender and sexuality and contributed to the critique of essentialism within feminism. Finally, Foucault's identification of the body as the principal target of power has been used by feminists to analyze contemporary forms of social control over women's bodies and minds.

Rather than focusing on the centralized sources of societal power in agencies such as the economy or the state, Foucault's analysis of power emphasizes micro level power relations. Foucault argues that, since modern power operates in a capillary fashion throughout the social body, it is best grasped in its concrete and local effects and in the everyday practices which sustain and reproduce power relations. This emphasis on the everyday practices through which power relations are reproduced has converged with the feminist project of analyzing the politics of personal relations and altering gendered power relations at the most intimate levels of experience 'in the institutions of marriage, motherhood and compulsory heterosexuality, in the ‘private' relations between the sexes and in the everyday rituals and regimens that govern women's relationships to themselves and their bodies (Sawicki 1998: 93). Nancy Fraser notes that Foucault's work gives renewed impetus to what is often referred to as 'the politics of everyday life’ in so far as it provides 'the empirical and conceptual basis for treating phenomena such as sexuality, the school, psychiatry, medicine and social science as political phenomena.' She argues that because Foucault’s approach to the analysis of power sanctions the treatment of problems in these areas as political problems it 'widens the arena within which people may collectively confront, understand and try to change the character of their lives' (Fraser 1989: 26). One of Foucault's most fertile insight into the workings of power at the micro-political level is his identification of the body and sexuality as the direct locus of social control. Foucault insists on the historical specificity of the body. It is this emphasis on the body as directly targeted and formed by historically variable regimes of bio-power that has made Foucault's version of poststructuralist theory the most attractive to feminist social and political theorists. The problem of how to conceive of the body without reducing its materiality to a fixed biological essence has been one of the key issues for feminist theory. At a fundamental level, a notion of the body is central to the feminist analysis of the oppression of women because biological differences between the sexes are the foundation that has served to ground and legitimize gender inequality. By means of an appeal to ahistorical biological characteristics, the idea that women are inferior to men is naturalized and legitimized. This involves two related conceptual moves. Firstly, women's bodies are judged inferior with reference to norms and ideals based on men's physical capacities and, secondly, biological functions are collapsed into social characteristics. While traditionally men have been thought to be capable of transcending the level of the biological through the use of their rational faculties, women have tended to be defined entirely it terms of their physical capacities for reproduction and motherhood. In an effort to avoid this conflation of the social category of woman with biological functions (essentialism), earlier forms of feminism developed a theory of social construction based on the distinction between sex and gender. The sex/gender distinction represents an attempt by feminists to sever the connection between the biological category of sex and the social category of gender. According to this view of social construction, gender is the cultural meaning that comes to be contingently attached to the sexed body. Once gender is understood as culturally constructed it is possible to avoid the essentialist idea that gender derives from the natural body in any one way. However, while the distinction between ahistorical biological sexes and culturally constructed gender roles challenges the notion that a woman's biological makeup is her social destiny, it entails a problematic dissociation of culturally constructed genders from sexed bodies. The effect of this dissociation is that the sexed body comes to be seen as irrelevant to an individual's gendered cultural identity. It is this disconcerting consequence of drawing a distinction between sex and gender that has led some feminists to appropriate Foucault's theory of the body and sexuality. In the first volume of The History of Sexuality, Foucault develops an anti-essentialist account of the sexual body, which, however, doesn't deny its materiality. At the heart of Foucault’s history of sexuality is an analysis of the production of the category of sex and its function in regimes of power aimed at controlling the sexual body. Foucault argues that the construct of a supposedly 'natural' sex functions to disguise the productive operation of power in relation to sexuality: 'The notion of sex brought about a fundamental reversal; it made it possible to invert the representation of the relationships of power to sexuality, causing the latter to appear, not in its essential and positive relation to power, but as being rooted in a specific and irreducible urgency which power tries as best it can to dominate' (Foucault 1978: 155). Foucault's claim here is that the relationship between power and sexuality is misrepresented when sexuality is viewed as an unruly natural force that power simply opposes, represses or constrains. Rather, the phenomenon of sexuality should be understood as constructed through the exercise of power relations. Drawing on Foucault's account of the historical construction of sexuality and the part played by the category of sex in this construction, feminists have been able to rethink gender, not as the cultural meanings that are attached to a pregiven sex, but, in Judith Butler's formulation, 'as the … cultural means by which "sexed nature" or “a natural sex" is produced and established as…prior to culture' (Butler 1990: 7). Following Foucault, Butler argues that the notion of a 'natural' sex that is prior to culture and socialization is implicated in the production and maintenance of gendered power relations because it naturalizes the regulatory idea of a supposedly natural heterosexuality and, thus, reinforces the reproductive constraints on sexuality. In addition to his anti-essentialist view of the body and sexuality, Foucault insists on the corporeal reality of bodies. He argues that this rich and complex reality is oversimplified by the biological category of sex which groups together in an 'artificial unity' a range of disparate and unrelated biological functions and bodily pleasures. Thus, in The History of Sexuality, Foucault explains that: 'The purpose of the present study is in fact to show how deployments of power are directly connected to the body - to bodies, functions, physiological processes, sensations, and pleasures; far from the body having to be effaced, what is needed is to make it visible through an analysis in which the biological and the historical are not consecutive to one another … but are bound together in an increasingly complex fashion in accordance with the development of the modern technologies of power that take life as their objective. Hence I do not envisage a "history of mentalities" that would take account of bodies only through the manner in which they have been perceived and given meaning and value; but a "history of bodies" and the manner in which what is most material and most vital in them has been invested' (Foucault 1978: 151-2). Because Foucault's anti-essentialist account of the body is nevertheless attentive to the materiality of bodies it has been attractive to feminists concerned to expose the processes through which the female body is transformed into a feminine body. Thus, in claiming that the body is directly targeted and 'produced' by power and, thus, unknowable outside of its cultural significations, Foucault breaks down the distinction between a natural sex and a culturally constructed gender. Elizabeth Grosz argues that, unlike some other versions of poststructuralist theory which analyze the representation of bodies without due regard for their materiality, Foucault's insistence on the corporeal reality of the body which is directly molded by social and historical forces avoids the traditional gendered opposition between the body and culture. For this reason, she believes that, while Foucault fails to consider the issue of sexual difference, his thought may contribute to the feminist project of exploring the relation between social power and the production of sexually differentiated bodies (Grosz 1994). Not all feminists, however, are comfortable with Foucault's anti-naturalistic rhetoric. Kate Soper argues that by jettisoning the idea of a natural body, Foucault's anti-essentialism might 'lend itself to the forces of reaction in so far as it offers itself as a pre-emptive warning against any politics which aims at the removal of the constraining and distorting effects of cultural stereotyping' (Soper 1993: 33). Here Soper articulates a common feminist concern about the potentially conservative political consequences of Foucault's version of social constructivism. By contrast, Lois McNay argues that although Foucault's model of the relation between the body and power precludes the view that the body and sexuality might be liberated from power, it leaves room for the possibility that existing forms of sexuality and gendered power relations might be transformed. According to McNay, Foucault's history of sexuality 'exposes the contingent and socially determined nature of sexuality and, thereby, frees the body from the regulatory fiction of heterosexuality and opens up new realms in which bodily pleasures can be explored' (McNay 1992: 30). In another fruitful engagement with Foucault's work on the body and power, feminist scholars have embraced the notion of normalizing-disciplinary power for its potential to shed light on the social control of women in a contemporary context. For example, Sandra Bartky's appropriation of Foucault takes the form of a detailed examination of the subjection of the female body to disciplinary practices such as dieting, exercise and beauty regimens that produce a form of embodiment which conforms to prevailing norms of feminine beauty and attractiveness. On her account these disciplinary practices subjugate women, not by taking power away from them, but by generating skills and competencies that depend on the maintenance of a stereotypical form of feminine identity. Bartky suggests that women's seemingly willing acceptance of the various norms and practices that promote their larger disempowerment is due to the fact that challenging 'the patriarchal construction of the female body… may call into question that aspect of personal identity that is tied to the development of a sense of competence' (Bartky 1988: 77; Sawicki 1994: 293). In a similar vein, Susan Bordo brings Foucauldian insights to bear in her analysis of predominantly female eating disorders such as anorexia nervosa and bulimia (Bordo 1988). Following Foucault, she argues that these disorders might be understood as disciplinary technologies of the body. The anorexic woman takes to an extreme the practices to which women subject themselves in their efforts to conform to cultural norms of an ideal feminine form. In the figure of the anorexic Bordo sees an association of power and self-control with the achievement of a potentially fatal slenderness. For Bordo, this association is a stark illustration of the way in which disciplinary power is linked to the social control of women. Disciplinary technologies are particularly effective forms of social control because they take hold of individuals at the level of their bodies, gestures, desires and habits to create individuals who are attached to and, thus, the unwitting agents of their own subjection. In other words, disciplinary power fashions individuals who 'voluntarily' subject themselves to self-surveillance and self-normalization. Thus, like Bartky, Bordo finds Foucault’s work useful to explain women's collusion with patriarchal standards of femininity.

4. Subjectivity, Identity and Resistance

Although the use that Bartky and Bordo make of Foucault's insights into the operation of normalizing disciplinary power is a corrective to his failure to recognize the gendered nature of disciplinary techniques, some feminists have argued that their work reproduces a problematic dimension of Foucault's account of modern disciplinary power. Jana Sawicki explains that the problem faced by this kind of feminist appropriation of Foucault is its inability to account for effective resistance to disciplinary practices. Like Foucault, Bartky and Bordo envisage modern disciplinary power as ubiquitous and inescapable. Foucauldian power reduces individuals to docile and subjected bodies and thus seems to deny the possibility of freedom and resistance. According to Sawicki, 'Bartky and Bordo have portrayed forms of patriarchal power that insinuate themselves within subjects so profoundly that it is difficult to imagine how they (we) might escape. They describe our complicity in patriarchal practices of victimization without providing suggestions about how we might resist it' (Sawicki 1988: 293).

Feminist critics of Foucault like Nancy Hartsock argue that his failure to develop an adequate notion of resistance is a consequence of his reduction of individuals to effects of power relations. Hartsock echoes a widespread feminist concern that Foucault's understanding of power reduces individuals to docile bodies, to victims of disciplinary technologies or objects of power rather than subjects with the capacity to resist (Hartsock 1990: 171-2). The problem for Hartsock and others is that without the assumption of a subject or individual that pre-exists its construction by technologies of power, it becomes difficult to explain who resists power? If there are no ready-made individuals with interests that are defined prior to their construction by power, then what is the source of our resistance? Some feminists have responded to these concerns by claiming that, although Foucault rejects the idea that resistance can be grounded in a subject or self who pre-exists its construction by power, he does not deny the possibility of resistance to power. In his later work Foucault explains that his theory of power implies both the possibility and existence of forms of resistance. According to Foucault: 'there are no relations of power without resistances; the latter are all the more real and effective because they are formed right at the point where relations of power are exercised' (Foucault 1980: 142). Foucauldian resistance neither predates the power it opposes nor issues from a site external to power. Rather it relies upon and grows out of the situation against which it struggles. Foucault's understanding of resistance as internal to power refuses the utopian dream of achieving total emancipation from power. In the place of total liberation Foucault envisages more specific, local struggles against forms of subjection aimed at loosening the constraints on possibilities for action. He suggests that a key struggle in the present is against the tendency of normalizing-disciplinary power to tie individuals to their identities in constraining ways. It is, Foucault contends, because disciplinary practices limit the possibilities of what we can be by fixing our identities that the object of resistance must be 'to refuse what we are' - that is, to fracture the limitations imposed on us by normalizing identity categories. Foucault's notion of resistance as consisting, at least in the first instance, in a refusal of fixed, stable or naturalized identity has been met with some suspicion by feminists. Many feminists are reluctant to abandon a commitment 'to some essential, liberatory subject rooted in "women's experience" (or nature), as the starting point for emancipatory theory’ (Sawicki 1994: 289). For Hartsock, Foucault's perspective functions to preclude the possibility of feminist politics which, she claims, is necessarily an identity-based politics grounded in a conception of the identity, needs and interests of women. Some of the most exciting feminist appropriations of Foucault converge around this issue of identity and its role in politics. Judith Butler argues that Foucault's work provides feminists with the resources to think beyond the strictures of identity politics. According to Butler, feminists should be wary of the idea that politics needs to be based on a fixed idea of women's nature and interests. She argues that: 'The premature insistence on a stable subject of feminism, understood as a seamless category of women, inevitably generates multiple refusals to accept the category. These domains of exclusion reveal the coercive and regulatory consequences of that construction, even when the construction has been elaborated for emancipatory purposes. Indeed, the fragmentation within feminism and the paradoxical opposition to feminism from "women" whom feminism claims to represent suggest the necessary limits of identity politics' (Butler 1990: 4). Butler discerns at least two problems in the attempt to ground politics in an essential, naturalized female identity. She argues that the assertion of the category 'woman' as the ground for political action excludes, marginalizes and inevitably misrepresents those who do not recognize themselves within the terms of that identity. For Butler the appeal to identity both overlooks the differences in power and resources between, for example, third world and Western women, and tends to make these differences a source of conflict rather than a source of strength. She claims, moreover, that a feminist identity politics that appeals to a fixed 'feminist subject,' 'presumes, fixes and constrains the very ‘subjects' that it hopes to represent and liberate’ (Butler 1990: 148). In Foucault's presentation of identity as an effect Butler sees new possibilities for feminist political practice, possibilities that are precluded by positions that take identity to be fixed or foundational. One of the distinct advantages of Foucault's understanding of the constituted character of identity is, in Butler's view, that it enables feminism to politicize the processes through which stereotypical forms of masculine and feminine identity are produced. Butler's own work represents an attempt to explore these processes for the purposes of loosening the heterosexual restrictions on identity formation. In pursuing this project she argues that Foucault's characterization of identity as constructed does not mean that it is completely determined or artificial and arbitrary. Rather, a Foucauldian approach to identity production demonstrates the role played by cultural norms in regulating how we embody or perform our gender identities. According to Butler, gender identity is simply 'a set of repeated acts within a highly rigid regulatory frame that congeal over time to produce the appearance of substance, of a natural sort of being' (Butler 1990: 33). The regulatory power of the norms that govern our performances of gender is both disguised and strengthened by the assumption that gendered identities are natural and essential. Thus, for Butler, one of the most important feminist aims should be to challenge dominant gender norms by exposing the contingent acts that produce the appearance of an underlying 'natural' gender identity. Against the claim that feminist politics is necessarily an identity politics, Butler suggests that: 'If identities were no longer fixed as the premises of a political syllogism, and politics no longer understood as a set of practices derived from the alleged interests that belong to a set of ready-made subjects, a new configuration of politics would surely emerge from the ruins of the old' (Butler 1990: 149). Butler envisages this new configuration of politics as an anti-foundational coalition politics that would accept the need to act within the tensions produced by contradiction, fragmentation and diversity. While Butler's political vision emphasises strategies for resisting and subverting identity, Wendy Brown argues that contemporary feminism should be wary of both identity politics and the 'politics of resistance' associated with the work of Foucault and Butler. Brown argues that identity politics entails a commitment to the authenticity of women's experiences which functions to secure political authority. At the same time, however, most feminists wish to acknowledge that feminine identity and experience are constructed under patriarchal conditions. Brown suggests that this inconsistency in feminist political thought - acknowledging social construction on the one hand and attempting to preserve a realm of authentic experience free from construction on the other - might be explained by the fact that feminists are reluctant to give up the claim to moral authority that the appeal to the truth and innocence of woman's experience secures. By appealing to the silenced truth of women’s experience, feminists have been able to condemn the repressive effects of patriarchal power. For Brown the attempt to establish moral authority by asserting the hidden truth of women's experience and identity represents a rejection of politics. She argues that this kind of move in feminism: '… betrays a preference for extrapolitical terms and practices: for Truth (unchanging and incontestable) over politics (flux, contest, instability); for certainty and security (safety; immutability, privacy) over freedom (vulnerability, publicity); for discoveries (science) over decisions (judgments); for separable subjects armed with established rights over unwieldy and shifting pluralities adjudicating for themselves and their future on the basis of nothing more than their own habits and arguments' (Brown 1995: 37). Brown finds a similar failure to meet the challenges confronting contemporary politics in the 'politics of resistance' inspired by Foucault. As she sees it, the problem with resistance-as-politics is that it does not 'contain a critique, a vision, or grounds for organized collective efforts to enact either… [resistance] goes nowhere in particular, has no inherent attachments and hails no particular vision' (Brown 1995: 49). In light of these inadequacies, Brown calls for the politics of resistance to be supplemented by a political practices aimed at cultivating 'political spaces for posing and questioning political norms [and] for discussing the nature of "the good" for women' (Brown 1995: 49). The creation of such democratic spaces for discussion will, Brown argues, contribute to teaching us how to have public conversations with each other and enable us to argue from our diverse perspectives about a vision of the common good ("what I want for us") rather than from some assumed common identity (“who I am”).

5. Freedom, Power and Politics

The key problems identified by feminist critics as preventing too close a convergence between Foucault's work and feminism - his reduction of social agents to docile bodies and the lack of normative guidance in his model of power and resistance - are indirectly addressed by Foucault in his late work on ethics. Whereas in his earlier genealogies Foucault emphasized the processes through which individuals were subjected to power, in his later writings he turned his attention to practices of self-constitution or 'practices of freedom' which he called ethics.

The idea of practicing freedom is central to Foucault's exploration and analysis of the ethical practices of Antiquity. It refers to the ways in which individuals in Antiquity were led to exercise power over themselves in the attempt to constitute or transform their identity and behavior in the light of specific goals. What interests Foucault about these ethical practices and ancient 'arts of existence' is the kind of freedom they presuppose. He suggests that the freedom entailed in practicing the art of self-fashioning consists neither in resisting power nor in seeking to liberate the self from regulation. Rather, it entails the active and conscious arrogation of the power of regulation by individuals for the purposes of ethical and aesthetic self-transformation. In her reflections on Foucault's positive account of freedom, Sawicki notes that it offers a more affirmative alternative to his earlier emphasis on the reactive strategy of resistance to normalization (Sawicki 1998: 104). For the late Foucault, individuals are still understood to be shaped by their embeddedness in power relations, which means that their capacities for freedom and autonomous action are necessarily limited. However, he suggests that by actively deploying the techniques and models of self-formation that are 'proposed, suggested, imposed' upon them by society (Foucault 1988b: 291), individuals may creatively transform themselves and in the process supplant the normalization operating in pernicious modern technologies of the self (Sawicki 1998: 105). Sawicki sees a link between Foucault's notion of practices of freedom and Donna Haraway’s call for a cyborg politics that emphasizes the conscious creation of marginalized subjects capable of resisting domination. In a more critical vein, feminists like Jean Grimshaw and McNay argue that Foucault's promising turn to a more active model of subjectivity still leaves crucial issues unresolved. In Grimshaws formulation, Foucault evades the vital question of 'when forms of self-discipline or self-surveillance can … be seen as exercises of autonomy or self-creation, or when they should be seen, rather, as forms of discipline to which the self is subjected, and by which autonomy is constrained' (Grimshaw 1993: 66; McNay 1992: 74). In response to this criticism, Moya Lloyd suggests that it is Foucault's earlier notion of genealogy as critique which allows us to distinguish between autonomous practices of the self and technologies of normalization. For Lloyd, the Foucauldian practice of critique - a practice which involves the effort to recognize, decipher and problematize the ways in which the self is produced - generates possibilities for alternative practices of the self and, thus, for more autonomous experiments in self-formation. Lloyd explains that 'it is not the activity of self-fashioning in itself that is crucial. It is the way in which that self-fashioning, when allied to critique, can produce sites of contestation over the meanings and contours of identity, and over the ways in which certain practices are mobilized' (Lloyd: 1988: 250). With the introduction of a notion of freedom in his late work, Foucault also clarifies the normative grounds for his opposition to certain forms of power. In his discussion of ethics, Foucault suggests that individuals are not limited to reacting against power, but may alter power relationships in ways that expand their possibilities for action. Thus, Foucault's work on ethics can be linked to his concern to counter domination, that is, forms of power that limit the possibilities for the autonomous development of the self's capacities. By distinguishing power relations that are mutable, flexible and reversible, from situations of domination in which resistance is foreclosed, Foucault seeks to encourage practices of liberty 'that will allow us to play … games of power with as little domination as possible' (Foucault 1988b: 298). Sawicki argues that Foucault's notion of practices of freedom has the potential to broaden our understanding of what it is to engage in emancipatory politics. In Foucault's conception of freedom as a practice aimed at minimizing domination, Sawicki discerns an implicit critique of traditional emancipatory politics which tends to conceive of liberty as a state free from every conceivable social constraint. Following Foucault, Sawicki argues that the problem with this notion of emancipation is that it does not go far enough: 'Reversing power positions without altering relations of power is rarely liberating. Neither is it a sufficient condition of liberation to throw off the yoke of domination' (Sawicki 1998: 102). If, as Foucault suggests, freedom exists only in being exercised and is, thus, a permanent struggle against what will otherwise be done to and for individuals, it is dangerous to imagine it as a state of being that can be guaranteed by laws and institutions. By insisting that liberation from domination is not enough to guarantee freedom, Foucault points to the importance of establishing new patterns of behaviour, attitudes and cultural forms that work to empower the vulnerable and, in this way, to ensure that mutable relations of power do not congeal into states of domination. Thus, for Sawicki, the value of Foucault's late work for feminism consists in the conceptual tools that it provides to think beyond traditional emancipatory theories and practices.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bartky, S., 'Foucault, femininity and the modernization of patriarchal power' in I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds), Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Bordo, S., 'Anorexia Nervosa: Psychopathology as the Crystallization of Culture' in I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds) Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Brown, W., 'Postmodern Exposures, Feminist Hesitations' in States of Injury: power and freedom in late modernity, Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1995.
  • Butler, J., Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity, NY: Routledge, 1990.
  • Butler, J., Bodies that Matter: On the Discursive Limits of "Sex", NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Diamond, I. & Quinby, L., (eds.) Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Dreyfus, H. and Rabinow, P., Michel Foucault: Beyond Structuralism and Hermeneutics, Sussex: The Harvester Press, 1982.
  • Foucault, M., Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison, trans. A. Sheridan, Harmondsworth: Peregrine, 1977.
  • Foucault, M., The History of Sexuality, translated by R. Hurley, Penguin Books, 1978.
  • Foucault, M., 'Body/Power' and ‘Truth and Power’ in C. Gordon (ed.) Michel Foucault: Power/Knowledge, U.K.: Harvester, 1980.
  • Foucault, M., 'The subject and power' in H. Dreyfus and P. Rabinow, Michel Foucault: Beyond Structuralism and Hermeneutics, Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1982.
  • Foucault, M., 'What is Enlightenment?' in The Foucault Reader, P. Rabinow (ed.) NY: Pantheon, 1984a.
  • Foucault, M., 'On the genealogy of ethics: an overview of work in progress' in The Foucault Reader, P. Rabinow (ed.) NY: Pantheon, 1984b.
  • Foucault, M., Politics, Philosophy, Culture: Interviews and Other Writings, 1977-1984, L. Kritzman (ed.), London: Routledge, 1988a.
  • Foucault, M., 'The ethic of care for the self as a practice of freedom' in J. Bernhauer and D. Rasmussen (eds), The Final Foucault, Cambridge: Mass.: MIT Press, 1988b.
  • Fraser, N., Unruly Practices: power, discourse and gender in contemporary social theory, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1989.
  • Grimshaw, J., 'Practices of Freedom' in Up Against Foucault, C. Ramazanoglu (ed.), London and NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Grosz, E., Volatile Bodies: Toward a Corporeal Feminism, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994.
  • Gutting, G., (ed.) The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Hacking, I., 'The Archaeology of Knowledge' in D. Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: a critical reader, NY: Basil Blackwell, 1986.
  • Hartsock, N., 'Foucault on power: a theory for women?' in L. Nicholson (ed.), Feminism/Postmodernism, London & NY: Routledge, 1990.
  • Hekman, S. (ed.) Feminist Interpretations of Michel Foucault, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania University Press, 1996.
  • Lloyd, M., 'A Feminist Mapping of Foucauldian Politics' in Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds), Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • McNay, L., Foucault: a critical introduction, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1994.
  • McNay, L., Foucault and Feminism: Power, Gender and the Self, Polity Press, 1992.
  • Ramazanoglu, C., Up Against Foucault: Explorations of Some Tensions Between Foucault and Feminism, London & NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Rouse, J., 'Power/Knowledge' in Gary Gutting (ed) The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Sawicki, J., 'Feminism and the Power of Discourse' in J. Arac (ed.) After Foucault: Humanistic Knowledge, Postmodern Challenges, New Brunswick and London: Rutgers University Press, 1988, pp. 161-178.
  • Sawicki, J., 'Foucault, feminism, and questions of identity' in ed. G. Gutting, The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Sawicki, J., 'Feminism, Foucault and "Subjects" of Power and Freedom' in The Later Foucault: politics and philosophy, J. Moss (ed.), London; Thousand Oaks: Sage Publications, 1998.
  • Soper, K., 'Productive contradictions', Up Against Foucault: Explorations of Some Tensions Between Foucault and Feminism, London & NY: Routledge, 1993.

Author Information

Aurelia Armstrong
University of Queensland

Luce Irigaray (1932—)

Luce Irigaray is a prominent author in contemporary French feminism and Continental philosophy. She is an interdisciplinary thinker who works between philosophy, psychoanalysis, and linguistics. Originally a student of the famous analyst Jacques Lacan, Irigaray's departure from Lacan in Speculum of the Other Woman, where she critiques the exclusion of women from both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory, earned her recognition as a leading feminist theorist and continental philosopher. Her subsequent texts provide a comprehensive analysis and critique of the exclusion of women from the history of philosophy, psychoanalytic theory and structural linguistics. Irigaray alleges that women have been traditionally associated with matter and nature to the expense of a female subject position. While women can become subjects if they assimilate to male subjectivity, a separate subject position for women does not exist. Irigaray's goal is to uncover the absence of a female subject position, the relegation of all things feminine to nature/matter, and, ultimately, the absence of true sexual difference in Western culture. In addition to establishing this critique, Irigaray offers suggestions for altering the situation of women in Western culture. Mimesis, strategic essentialism, utopian ideals, and employing novel language, are but some of the methods central to changing contemporary culture. Irigaray's analysis of women's exclusion from culture and her use of strategic essentialism have been enormously influential in contemporary feminist theory. Her work has generated productive discussions about how to define femininity and sexual difference, whether strategic essentialism should be employed, and assessing the risk involved in engaging categories historically used to oppress women. Irigaray's work extends beyond theory into practice. Irigaray has been actively engaged in the feminist movement in Italy. She has participated in several initiatives in Italy to implement a respect for sexual difference on a cultural and, in her most recent work, governmental level. Her contributions to feminist theory and continental philosophy are many and her complete works present her readers with a rewarding challenge to traditional conceptions of gender, self, and body.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Irigaray's Project
  3. Influences
    1. Psychoanalysis
    2. Philosophy
  4. Major Themes
    1. Mimesis
    2. Novel Language and Utopian Ideals
    3. Mother/Daughter Relationships
    4. Language
    5. Ethics
    6. Politics
  5. Criticisms
    1. Strategic Essentialism
    2. Privileges Psychological Oppression
    3. Elides Differences
    4. Opaque Writing Style
    5. Exclusive Ethics
    6. Later Work
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. English Translations
    2. Suggested Further Reading

1. Biography

In a 1993 interview with Margaret Whitford, Luce Irigaray specifically says that she does not like to be asked personal questions. She does not want opinions about her everyday life to interfere with interpretations of her ideas. Irigaray believes that entrance into intellectual discussions is a hard won battle for women and that reference to biographical material is one way in which women's credibility is challenged. It is no surprise that detailed biographical information about Irigaray is limited and that different accounts conflict.

What remains constant between accounts is that Luce Irigaray was born in Belgium in 1932. She holds two doctoral degrees-one in Philosophy and the other in Linguistics. She is also a trained and practicing psychoanalyst. She has held a research post at the Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique de Paris since 1964. She is currently the Director of Research in Philosophy at the center, and also continues her private practice. Perhaps the most well known fact of Irigaray's life-which Irigaray herself refers to in the opening of je, tu, nous-is her education at, and later expulsion from, the Ecole Freudienne de Paris (Freudian School of Paris). The Ecole Freudienne was founded by the famous psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan. Irigaray trained at the school in the sixties. In 1974, she published the thesis she wrote while studying at the school, Speculum, de l'autre femme, translated into English as Speculum of the Other Woman. This thesis criticized-among philosophical topics-the phallocentrism of Freudian and Lacanian psychoanalysis. The publication of this thesis gained her recognition, but also negatively affected Irigaray's career. She was relieved of her teaching post at the University of Vincennes and was ostracized by the Lacanian community. In spite of these early hardships, Irigaray went on to become an influential and prolific author in contemporary feminist theory and continental philosophy. In addition to her intellectual accomplishments, Irigaray is committed to active participation in the women's movement in both France and internationally-especially in Italy. Several of her later texts are dedicated to her work in the women's movement of Italy. She is still actively researching and publishing.

2. Irigaray's Project

Irigaray argues that, since ancient times, mothers have been associated with nature and unthinking matter. Further, Irigaray believes that all women have historically been associated with the role of "mother" such that, whether or not a woman is a mother, her identity is always defined according to that role. This is in contrast to men who are associated with culture and subjectivity. While excluded from culture and subjectivity, women serve as their unacknowledged support. In other words, while women are not considered full subjects, society itself could not function without their contributions. Irigaray ultimately states that Western culture itself is founded upon a primary sacrifice of the mother, and all women through her.

Based on this analysis, Irigaray says that sexual difference does not exist. True sexual difference would require that men and women are equally able to achieve subjectivity. As is, Irigaray believes that men are subjects (e.g. self-conscious, self-same entities) and women are "the other" of these subjects (e.g. the non-subjective, supporting matter). Only one form of subjectivity exists in Western culture and it is male. While Irigaray is influenced by both psychoanalytic theory and philosophy, she identifies them both as influential discourses that exclude women from a social existence as mature subjects. In many of her texts, Irigaray seeks to unveil how both psychoanalytic theory and philosophy exclude women from a genuine social existence as autonomous subjects, and relegate women to the realm of inert, lifeless, inessential matter. With this critique in place, Irigaray suggests how women can begin to reconfigure their identity such that one sex does not exist at the expense of the other. However, she is unwilling to definitively state what that new identity should be like. Irigaray refrains from prescribing a new identity because she wants women to determine for themselves how they want to be defined. While both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory are her targets, Irigaray identifies philosophy as the master discourse. Irigaray's reasons for this designation are revealed in Speculum of the Other Woman where she demonstrates how philosophy-since Ancient times-has articulated fundamental epistemological, ontological, and metaphysical truths from a male perspective that excludes women. While she is not suggesting that philosophy is single-handedly responsible for the history of women's oppression, she wants to emphasize that the similar type of exclusion manifest in both philosophy and psychoanalysis predates the birth of psychoanalysis. As the companion discourse to philosophy, psychoanalysis plays a unique role. While Irigaray praises psychoanalysis for utilizing the method of analysis to reveal the plight of female subjectivity, she also thinks that it reinforces it. Freud attempts to explain female subjectivity and sexuality according to a male model. From this perspective, female subjectivity looks like a deformed or insufficiently developed form of male subjectivity. Irigaray argues that if Freud had turned the tools of analysis onto his own discourse, then he would have seen that female subjectivity cannot be understood through the lenses of a one-sex model. In other words, negative views of women exist because of theoretical bias-not because of nature. Through her critiques of both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory, Irigaray argues that women need to attain a social existence separate from the role of mother. However, this alone will not change the current state of affairs. For Irigaray is not suggesting that the social role of women will change if they merely step over the line of nature into culture. Irigaray believes that true social change will occur only if society challenges its perception of nature as unthinking matter to be dominated and controlled. Thus, while women must attain subjectivity, men must become more embodied. Irigaray argues that both men and women have to reconfigure their subjectivity so that they both understand themselves as belonging equally to nature and culture. Irigaray's discussions of mimesis, novel language and utopian ideals, reconfiguring the mother/daughter relationship, altering language itself, ethics, and politics are all central to achieving this end.

3. Influences

Irigaray's interdisciplinary interests in philosophy, psychoanalysis, and linguistics underscore that her work has more than one influence. Two main discourses that maintain a strong presence throughout her work are psychoanalysis, with Sigmund Freud and Jacques Lacan as its representatives, and philosophy. Insofar as Lacanian psychoanalysis works out of a background in structural linguistics, both Lacan and Irigaray also focus on language. Irigaray engages with philosophy, psychoanalysis and linguistics in order to uncover the lack of true sexual difference in Western culture.

a. Psychoanalysis

Irigaray states on the opening page of An Ethics of Sexual Difference that each age is defined by a philosophical issue that calls to be thoroughly examined-ours is sexual difference. Sexual difference is often associated with the anatomical differences between the sexes. However, Irigaray follows the French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan in understanding sexual difference as a difference that is assigned in language. While Irigaray is critical of Lacan, she is influenced by Lacan's interpretation of Freud's theory of subject formation.

Freud's work has served as a starting point for diverse psychoanalytic theories such as drive theory, object relations theory, and ego psychology. Lacan interprets Freud's work from a background in structural linguistics, philosophy, and, of course, psychoanalysis. Of particular importance to Irigaray's work is Lacan's claim that there are two key moments in the formation of a child's identity: the formation of an imaginary body and the assignation of sexual difference in language. Freud introduces the idea of an imaginary body in The Ego and the Id, in the section of the same name, when he describes the ego (self-consciousness) as neither strictly a psychic phenomenon nor a bodily phenomenon. Freud believes that an ego is formed in reference to a body, such that the manner in which an infant understands his or her selfhood is inseparable from his or her bodily existence. However, the body that an infant attributes to him or herself is not objectively understood-it is the mind's understanding of the body. This means that a person's understanding of his or her own body is imbued with a degree of fantasy and imagination. In his famous essay "The Mirror Stage as Formative of the I," Lacan expands Freud's comments on the bodily ego into a theory about imaginary anatomy. Lacan states that the first of two key moments in subject formation is the projection of an imaginary body. This occurs in the mirror stage at roughly six months. As a being who still lacks mobility and motor control, an infant who is placed in front of a mirror (another person can serve here as well, typically the mother) will identify with the unified, idealized image that is reflected back in the mirror. While the image in the mirror does not match the infant's experience, it is a key moment in the development of his or her ego. Rather than identify with him or herself as a helpless being, the child choose to identify with the idealized image of him or herself. Lacan believes that the element of fantasy and imagination involved in the identification with the mirror image marks the image as simultaneously representative and misrepresentative of the infant. While the body of the mirror stage is key to the infant's identity, it is also only an interpretation of his or her biological existence. In other words, according to Lacan, one's understanding of one's body occurs only in conjunction with an organization in language and image that begins in the mirror stage, and is further complicated by the next stage of ego formation-entrance into the Symbolic order. Irigaray agrees with Lacan that how we understand our biology is largely culturally influenced-thus does she accept the idea of an imaginary body. Irigaray employs the Lacanian imaginary body in her discussions about Western culture's bias against women. Irigaray argues that, like people, cultures project dominant imaginary schemes which then affect how that culture understands and defines itself. According to Irigaray, in Western culture, the imaginary body which dominates on a cultural level is a male body. Irigaray thus argues that Western culture privileges identity, unity, and sight-all of which she believes are associated with male anatomy. She believes that fields such as philosophy, psychoanalysis, science and medicine are controlled by this imaginary. Three examples from her work illustrate her view. In Speculum of the Other Woman, Irigaray addresses Freud's claim in his essay "Femininity" that little girls are only little men. She argues that Freud could not understand women because he was influenced by the one-sex theory of his time (men exist and women are a variation of men), and expanded his own, male experience of the world into a general theory applicable to all humans. According to Irigaray, since Freud was unable to imagine another perspective, his reduction of women to male experience resulted in viewing women as defective men. Another example is found in "Cosi Fan Tutti," (in This Sex Which Is Not One) where Irigaray argues that Lacan's ahistorical master signifier of the Symbolic order-the Phallus-is a projection of the male body. Irigaray argues that Lacan failed to diagnose the error of his predecessor, Freud, and similarly understood the world-and especially language-in terms of a one-sex model of sexuality and subjectivity. Although Lacan claims that the Phallus is not connected to male biology, his appropriation of Freud renders this claim false. A final example is found in "The Mechanics of 'Fluids'" (also in This Sex Which Is Not One) where Irigaray argues that science itself is biased towards categories typically personified as masculine (e.g. solids as opposed to fluids). Irigaray believes that if women are not understood in Western culture, it is because Western culture has yet to accept alternate paradigms for understanding them. While selfhood begins in the mirror stage with the imaginary body, it is not solidified until one enters the Symbolic order. According to Lacan, the Symbolic order is an ahistorical system of language that must be entered for a person to have a coherent social identity. The Phallus is the privileged master signifier of the Symbolic order. One must have a relationship to the Phallus if one is to attain social existence. According to Lacan, infants in the mirror stage do not differentiate between themselves and the world. For example, an infant views him or herself as continuous with his or her mother, and this understanding of the mother-child relationship organizes the infant's world. However, as the infant matures, he or she becomes aware that his or her mothers' attention is not wholly directed toward the infant in a reciprocal manner. The mother participates in a larger social context dominated by the Symbolic order. The infant fantasizes that if he or she could occupy the role of the Phallus-the master signifer of that Symbolic order-he or she could regain the full attention of the mother. However, this is impossible. In exchange for giving up this fantasy-which the Father demands of the child in the Oedipus complex-the infant gains his or her own relationship to the Phallus. The infant must break with the mother (nature, pre-symbolic) in order to become a subject (culture, symbolic order). One among many unique claims of Lacan's is that the infant acquires sexual difference in his or her relationship to the Phallus. According to Lacan, sexual difference is not about biological imperative (e.g. if you have a penis you are male, if you have a vagina you are female), it is about having one of two types of relationship to the Phallus-having or being the Phallus. Hence, in the Lacanian view, the body as humans understand it is something that is constructed in the mirror stage, and sexually differentiated in the entrance to the Symbolic order. Irigaray critically appropriates this radical description of sexual difference. She discusses the linguistic character of sexual difference in a manner similar to Lacan in This Sex Which Is Not One. Irigaray is more concerned with how culture-and language as a product of culture-understands sexual difference and subjectivity than with arguing that truths about sexual difference or subjectivity emerge out of biology itself. However she distances herself from Lacan in two key manners. First, Irigaray disagrees with Lacan's depiction of the Symbolic order as ahistorical and unchanging. Irigaray believes that language systems are malleable, and largely determined by power relationships that are in flux. Second, Irigaray remains unconvinced by Lacan's claims that the Phallus is an ahistorical master signifier of the Symbolic order that has no connection to male anatomy. In "Cosi Fan Tutti," she argues that the Phallus is not a purely symbolic category, but is ultimately an extension of-and reinforcement of-Freud's description of the world according to a one-sex model. According to Irigaray, the Phallus as the master signifier (that can be traced back to male anatomy) is evidence that the Symbolic order is constructed and not ahistorical.

b. Philosophy

Irigaray is also influenced by her extensive study of the history of philosophy. Texts such as Speculum of the Other Woman and An Ethics of Sexual Difference demonstrate her command of the philosophical canon. Speculum of the Other Woman discusses the elision of all things feminine in traditional thinkers such as Aristotle, Descartes, Kant, and Hegel. An Ethics of Sexual Difference also discusses the elision of the feminine, but specifically from the perspective of ethical relationships between men and women. An Ethics of Sexual Difference addresses thinkers as diverse as Plato, Merleau-Ponty, Spinoza, and Levinas. Irigaray is also writing a series of texts devoted to the four elements. The elemental works Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche and The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger are sustained discussions of the exclusions implemented by key male philosophers.

No one philosopher can be identified as influencing Irigaray. She appropriates from various thinkers while maintaining a critical distance. For example, her method of mimesis resembles Derridian deconstruction. However, she also criticizes Derrida's deconstruction of the category "woman" (see Derrida's Spurs) in Marine Lover. As another example, she agrees with Heidegger that every age has a concept that underlies and informs its beliefs, but is radically unknown to it. For Heidegger it was "Being," for Irigaray it is "sexual difference." Like Heidegger, she wants to investigate the concept that Western culture takes to be self-evident in order to show that it is unknown to us. However she is critical in The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger of Heidegger's exclusion of women. One can also find Levinasian (An Ethics of Sexual Difference), Hegelian (I love to you) or Marxist (This Sex Which Is Not One, "Women on the Market") undertones in Irigaray's discussions of ethics and dialectical thinking. While she is clearly influenced by the history of philosophy, her own project of creating a new space for redefining women does not permit her to privilege any one philosophical approach.

4. Major Themes

a. Mimesis

Irigaray describes herself as analyzing both the analysts and the philosophers. Perhaps the most famous critical tool employed by Irigaray is mimesis. Mimesis is a process of resubmitting women to stereotypical views of women in order to call the views themselves into question. Key to mimesis is that the stereotypical views are not repeated faithfully. One example is that if women are viewed as illogical, women should speak logically about this view. According to Irigaray, the juxtaposition of illogical and logical undermines the claim that women are illogical. Or if women's bodies are viewed as multiple and dispersed, women should speak from that position in a playful way that suggests that this view stems from a masculine economy that values identity and unity (e.g. the penis or the Phallus) and excludes women as the other (e.g. lack, dispersed, or "nothing to see"). This type of mimesis is also known as strategic essentialism. Irigaray's essay "This Sex Which Is Not One," in the text of the same name, provides several clear examples of this method.

According to Irigaray, the very possibility of repeating a negative view unfaithfully suggests that women are something other than the view expressed. Irigaray repeats the views because she believes that overcoming harmful views of women cannot occur through simply ignoring the views. True to the methodology of psychoanalysis, she believes that negative views can only be overcome when they are exposed and demystified. When successfully employed, mimesis repeats a negative view-without reducing women to that view-and makes fun of it such that the view itself must be discarded. Irigaray's wager in utilizing mimesis with regard to female subjectivity is as follows. Male dominance has defined Western culture for centuries. If a new form of subjectivity comes into being out of the death of the modern, transcendental subject, and we have never really investigated or mimetically engaged with the deformed, female form of subjectivity that accompanied and sustained the male form, then what would prevent the logic of master/subject/male and slave/other/female from repeating itself? According to Irigaray, the logic will not be altered until we call attention to the fact that subjectivity has changed before when male dominance has not. We must ask after the feminine other. Irigaray believes that only by asking after the other through mimesis will it be possible to affect a paradigm shift. Irigaray therefore speaks from the silenced position of women in order to (a) challenge the authority of either the negative view or the repression by revealing that position to be nothing more than a fabrication (b) show how the woman/body has been excluded by either revealing the stereotypical view to be false or by inciting the excluded woman/body to speak and (c) thereby force a shift in the conception of female subjectivity and the body. Irigaray employs mimesis because she believes that a 'second sex' cannot exist in its own right (or with a positive form of identity as opposed to being viewed as a deformed version of male identity) until we have not only challenged, but also passed back through the oppressive formulation of sexual difference in contemporary Western culture.

b. Novel Language and Utopian Ideals

While the goal of mimesis is to problematize the male definition of femininity to such a degree that a new definition of and, ultimately, an embodied subject position for women can emerge, Irigaray says in her earlier work that she will not prescribe in advance either the definition or the subject position. In This Sex Which Is Not One, Irigaray clearly indicates that she will not redefine femininity because it would interfere with women redefining themselves for themselves. Further, she believes that she cannot describe the feminine (e.g. female subjectivity, the female imaginary body) outside of the current, male definitions without further disrupting the male definitions of women. A new definition for women has to emerge out of a mimetic engagement with the old definitions, and it is a collective process.

Irigaray is, however, willing to provide material to help ignite the process of redefinition. The material she offers varies from new concepts about religion and bodies-expressed through both the novel use of existing words and the creation of new words-to utopian ideals. One example of a new concept that she puts into play through novel language is her discussion of the sensible/transcendental and female divinity. Irigaray introduces these concepts in order to disrupt male dominance in religion. Irigaray follows Feuerbach in interpreting the divine as an organizing principle for both identity and culture. Religion is thus viewed as caught up in power and culture. Irigaray specifically targets male dominated religions that posit a transcendental God. She believes that these religions reinforce male dominance and the division of the world into male/subject and female/body. She suggests that in place of a religion that focuses on a transcendent God, we construct a divinity that is both sensible and transcendental. In other words, given the connection between religion and culture, and the manner in which the mind/body split has fallen out along gender lines, why not propose a vision of divinity that will help Western culture overcome its dualisms and prejudices about those dualisms. Irigaray is not prescribing the sensible/transcendental as a new religion to be implemented and followed, but merely placing it in circulation as a creative impetus for change. An example of utopian ideals can be found in Sexes and Genealogies, thinking the difference, and je, tu, nous. In these texts, Irigaray describes civil laws that she believes would help women achieve social existence (mature subjectivity) in Western culture. In one law she suggests that virginity needs to be protected under the law so that women have control over their own sexuality. She also describes new ways in which the mother/daughter relationship should be legally protected, and outlines how mothers and daughters can communicate with each other so that female subjectivity can be further developed. When these texts were first published, these views were widely interpreted as suggestions intended to initiate discussions between women (utopian ideals) and not as prescriptions for social change. While Irigaray's later work has complicated this interpretation, it is still widely accepted.

c. Mother/Daughter Relationships

According to Irigaray, while it is necessary to alter cultural norms, it is equally as important to address the problematic nature of individual relationships between women-especially the mother/daughter relationship. To emphasize how mother/daughter relationships are sundered in contemporary Western culture, Irigaray turns to Greek mythology. For example, she discusses the myth of Demeter, the goddess of the earth (agriculture), and her daughter Persephone. In the myth, Zeus, Persephone's father, aids his brother Hades, king of the underworld, to abduct the young Perspephone. Hades has fallen in love with Persephone and wants her to be queen of the underworld. When Demeter learns that her daughter is missing, she is devastated and abandons her role as goddess of the earth. The earth becomes barren. To reestablish harmony in the world, Zeus needs Demeter to return to her divine responsibilities. Zeus orders Hades to return Persephone. However, Persephone is tricked into eating a pomegranate seed that binds her to Hades forever. Under the persuasion of Zeus, Hades agrees to release Persephone from the underworld for half of each year. Irigaray reads this myth as an example of both a positive mother/daughter relationship, and the success of men at breaking it apart. Demeter and Persephone love each other and Demeter strives to protect her daughter. However, in this myth they are ultimately at the mercy of the more powerful males. The myth is also an example of men exchanging women as if they were commodities. Zeus conspires with his brother and, in effect, gives his daughter away without consulting either Persephone or Demeter. Irigaray believes that myths tell us something about the deterioration of the mother/daughter relationship and the manner in which men have traditionally controlled the fate of women-whether they are wives, daughters, sisters, or mothers. Irigaray utilizes myth to suggest that mothers and daughters need to protect their relationships and strengthen their bonds to one another.

The need to alter the mother/daughter relationship is a constant theme in Irigaray's work. While she believes that women's social and political situation has to be addressed on a global level, she also thinks that change begins in individual relationships between women. Thus she stresses the need for mothers to represent themselves differently to their daughters, and to emphasize their daughter's subjectivity. For example, in je, tu, nous, Irigaray offers suggestions for developing mother-daughter relationships such as displaying images of the mother-daughter couple, or consciously emphasizing that the daughter and the mother are both subjects in their own right. Changing relationships between mothers and daughters also requires language work.

d. Language

Since Irigaray agrees with Lacan that one must enter language (culture) in order to be a subject, she believes that language itself must change if women are to have their own subjectivity that is recognized at a cultural level. She believes that language typically excludes women from an active subject position. Further, inclusion of women in the current form of subjectivity is not the solution. Irigaray's goal is for there to be more than one subject position in language.

In order to prove that language excludes women from subjectivity, Irigaray conducted research that links the exclusion of women from subjectivity in Western culture to the speech patterns of men and women. She concluded that general speech patterns specific to each sex do exist and that women often do not occupy the subject position in language. She argues that in language experiments, women were less willing to occupy the subject position. Referring to the French language as a clear example-even though she believes that the structure of the English language does not exempt it from sexism-she discusses the dominance of the masculine in both the plural and the neuter, which takes the same form as the masculine. Irigaray argues that objects of value, such as the sun or God, are typically marked with the masculine gender while less important objects are feminine. Since language and society mutually affect each other, Irigaray believes that language must change along with society. Failure to see the importance of changing language is an impediment to real change. According to Irigaray, it is crucial that women learn to occupy the position of "I" and "you" in language. Irigaray views the "I" and the "you" as markers of subjectivity. In her text I love to you, Irigaray describes how she determined that women do not occupy the subject position. She conducted an experiment where she gave her subjects a noun (e.g. enfant) and asked her test subjects to use the noun in a sentence as a pronoun (il or elle). The majority of both men and women consistently chose "il". She noted in another experiment, where she gave a sequence that implied the use of "elle" (e.g. robe-se-voir), that both sexes avoided using "elle" (she) and "elle se" (she herself) as an active subject. In contrast, when she gave a sequence that implied the use of il as a subject, it was almost always used. Further, Irigaray discovered that young girls seek an intersubjective dialogue with their mothers, but that their mothers did not reciprocate. Irigaray concludes from her research that women are not subjects in language in the same way as men. She believes that men and women do not produce the same sentences with similar cues, they use prepositions differently, and they represent temporality in language differently. Irigaray seeks for men and women to recognize each other in language as irreducible others. She argues that this cannot happen until women occupy the subject position, and men learn to communicate with other subjects. Irigaray believes that a language of 'indirection' could help bring this to fruition. She describes this in her book I love to you. The title itself is an example of this language of indirection. Saying "I love to you" rather than "I love you" is a way of symbolizing a respect for the other. The "to" is a verbal barrier against appropriating or subjugating the other. Speaking differently in this manner is an integral part of Irigaray's general project to cultivate true intersubjectivity between the genders. However, she does not put forth a definitive plan for implementing this change in language.

e. Ethics

While ethics is a constant theme throughout her work, Irigaray's text An Ethics of Sexual Difference is devoted to this theme. In this text, Irigaray intertwines essays of her own on the ethics of sexual difference with dialogues that she has created between herself and six male philosophers: Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Spinoza, Merleau-Ponty and Levinas. Irigaray groups the dialogues into four sections that each begin with an essay of her own about sexual difference and love. Her own essay signals what themes she will address with regard to each of the philosophers she discusses. Irigaray utilizes her analyses of the male philosophers to discuss the following themes which are essential to her ethics: creative relationships between men and women that are not based in reproduction, separate 'places' for men and women (emotional and embodied), wonder at the difference of the other, acknowledgement of finiteness and intersubjectivity, and an embodied divinity.

In the first section, which engages Plato and Aristotle, Irigaray emphasizes that an ethical love relationship must be creative independent of procreation, and that both men and women need to have a place for themselves (be embodied individuals) that is open to, but not subsumable by, the other. In the second section, using Descartes and Spinoza, she argues that ethical love cannot occur between men and women until there is respect and wonder for the irreducible difference of the other, and an admittance and acceptance of one's finiteness. In the third section, in which there is no engagement with a male philosopher, Irigaray describes how the infinite is essential to love between men and women. She believes that it is unethical that women have not had access to subjectivity, and that the universals of our culture have been dominated by a male imaginary. She says that ethics requires that men and women understand themselves as embodied subjects. In the fourth and final section, Irigaray discusses Merleau-Ponty and Levinas. She argues that if ethical relationships are to occur between men and women, men must overcome nostalgia for the womb. Thus will they develop their identity, and open up a space for women to create their own. Further, Irigaray believes that we must think both otherness and divinity in conjunction with embodiment. She believes that separating mind and body is unethical insofar as it perpetuates the division in culture between man/mind and woman/body. Ethics involves thinking of otherness and divinity in terms of the sensible/transcendental. At the end of her An Ethics of Sexual Difference, it is clear that Irigaray does not believe that Western culture is ethical, and that the primary reason is its treatment of women and nature. She believes that nothing short of altering our views of subjectivity, science, and religion can change this situation. Men and women must work together to learn to respect the irreducible difference between them. Women must become full subjects, and men must recognize that they are embodied. Further, ethical love relationships are based in respect for alterity and creativity outside of reproduction. Her text I love to you, which focuses on both language and ethics, is a clear example of how her discussion of ethics can also be developed from a Hegelian perspective.

f. Politics

Irigaray refuses to belong to any one group in the feminist movement because she believes that there is a tendency for groups to set themselves up against each other. When groups within the women's movement fight each other, this detracts from the overall goal of trying to positively alter the social, political, and symbolic position of women. Irigaray models solidarity among women in her unwillingness to belong exclusively to one group.

Irigaray is particularly active in the feminist movement in Italy. Texts such as I love to you, Democracy Begins Between Two, and Two Be Two were all inspired by and, at various moments, give accounts of Irigaray's experience with the Italian women's movement. An example of Irigaray's most recent collaborations with Italy, and a testimony to her commitment to her ideas, is her collaboration with the Commission for Equal Opportunities for the region of Emilia-Romagna. She was invited by this region to educate its citizens about her political ideals. Her text, Democracy Begins Between Two, was a part of that collaboration insofar as it was the theoretical work behind her role as adviser. In that text she also describes how she and Renzo Imbeni co-authored a "Report on Citizenship of the Union." This report argued for rights based on sexual difference and was submitted to the European Parliament for ratification.

5. Criticisms

a. Strategic Essentialism

Irigaray's use of strategic essentialism has been criticized as essentialism itself-or of endorsing the belief that social behavior follows from biology. The appearance of her translated work in the United States was met with great opposition. She was read as further naturalizing women at a time when women were benefiting both politically and socially from arguing that biology did not matter. Irigaray and her supporters defended her engagement with essentialist views as a strategy. They argued that when Irigaray seeks to alter the exclusion of the feminine by repeating or reiterating naturalizing discourses about female bodies, she is not suggesting a return to a lost female body that pre-exists patriarchy. Rather, she is employing her strategy of mimesis. While many contemporary interpreters now accept this view, strategic essentialism remains a controversial aspect of Irigaray's work.

b. Privileges Psychological Oppression

Irigaray has been criticized-especially by materialist feminists-on the grounds that she privileges questions of psychological oppression over social/material oppression. The concern is that the psychoanalytic discourse that Irigaray relies upon-even though she is critical of it-universalizes and abstracts away from material conditions that are of central concern to feminism. Materialist feminists do not believe that definitive changes in the structure of politics can result from the changes Irigaray proposes in psychoanalytic theories of subject formation. However, Irigaray's goal to challenge psychoanalytic theory and to change the definition of femininity evinces an agreement with the materialist position. Both agree that the ahistorical, overly universalized character of traditional psychoanalytic theory must be rejected. Further, Irigaray argues that focusing on language work and on altering allegedly intractable structures does not mean that women have to ignore material conditions. In This Sex Which Is Not One, Irigaray says that simultaneous with her challenges to the symbolic order, women must fight for equal wages, and against discrimination in employment and education. Irigaray recognizes that it is important to find ways to challenge the social and economic position in which women find themselves. But focusing exclusively on women's material or economic situation as the key to change will only-at best-grant women access to a male social role insofar as it will not change the definition of women. Irigaray's response to first changing material conditions would be that it would leave the question of a non-patriarchal view of female identity untouched. Due to the force of the oppression of women, it is the definitions that have to be changed before women, as distinct from men, will attain a social existence.

c. Elides Differences

Related to the materialist critique is the question of whether or not Irigaray's psychoanalytic approach can account for real differences between women. Irigaray often discusses a subject position for women and a new definition of women. A common question asked of Irigaray is whether or not a universal definition for women is desirable considering the real differences between women. More specifically, if Irigaray insists on a universal subject position for women, will it be exclusively determined by first world, white, middle class women? Can her universal successfully include the experiences of minority women, second and third world women, and economically disadvantaged women? Or does it create further exclusion among the excluded themselves? Irigaray's interpreters remain divided on this question.

d. Opaque Writing Style

Irigaray is often criticized along with other French feminists, such as Julia Kristeva, for the opacity of her writing style. Based on her writing style, she has been dismissed as elitist. Irigaray's writing is undeniably challenging and complex. But, the difficulty of her work can be equally productive as it is labor intensive. Irigaray's opacity can be viewed as fruitful when understood in conjunction with one mode of writing that she assumes-that of an analyst. In this style of writing, Irigaray not only will not assume the position of a master-knower who imparts knowledge in a linear manner, she also considers her readers' reactions to her work to be an integral part of that work. Her alleged failure to be clear, or to give a concrete, linear feminist theory, are invitations for readers to imagine their own vision for the future. Like the psychoanalytic session, her texts are a collaboration between writer (analyst) and reader (analysand). Irigaray believes that, through writing in this style, she can take culture as a whole as her analysand.

e. Exclusive Ethics

Irigaray's view of ethics is criticized because she describes the quintessential ethical relationship using a man and a woman. The question arises of whether or not Irigaray is suggesting that the heterosexual couple is the model for ethical relationships. Since it is unclear whether or not Irigaray's view can be applied to other types of relationships (e.g. same sex friendships or same sex love relationships), this point of criticism remains unresolved. Related to this critique is a concern that Irigaray's emphasis on sexual difference and male/female relationships also prevent her from accounting for non-traditional family arrangements.

f. Later Work

Irigaray's most recent work raises the final point of controversy. In her earlier work, Irigaray refuses to give a new definition of women because she thinks that women must give it to themselves. However, in her most recent work she has developed laws that she submitted to the European Parliament for ratification. Irigaray's interpreters debate about the relationship between her early work and her most recent texts. Is there continuity between the early and the later position? Or has Irigaray abandoned her earlier project? A spectrum of interpretations are available with no final answer.

6. References and Further Reading

a. English Translations

  • Irigaray, Luce. An Ethics of Sexual Difference. Trans. Carolyn Burke and Gillian C. Gill. Ithaca: Cornell UP, 1993.
    • Mimetic engagement with Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Spinoza, Merleau-Ponty, and Levinas on the question of ethics. Irigaray elaborates here her own vision for ethical relationships.
  • Between East and West: From Singularity to Community. Trans. Stephen Pluhácek. New York: Columbia UP, 2002.
    • Draws on Eastern philosophy and meditative techniques such as yoga to suggest new approaches to the question of sexual difference.
  • Democracy Begins Between Two. Trans. Kirsteen Anderson. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Inspired by a partnership with the Commission for Equal Opportunities for the region of Emilia-Romagna in Italy, this text describes civil rights for women that would grant them an equal social position to men. This text also includes the Report on Citizenship of the Union by Renzo Imbeni. This report was written in collaboration with Irigaray and submitted to the European Parliament for ratification.
  • Elemental Passions. Trans. Joanne Collie and Judith Still. New York: Routledge, 1992.
    • One text in Irigaray's series of elemental works. Addresses the relationship between men and women within the context of the elements and the senses.
  • je, tu, nous: towards a culture of difference. Trans. Alison Martin. New York: Routledge, 1993.
    • A series of essays that address diverse issues such as civil rights for women and prejudices in biology about the mother-fetus relationship.
  • I love to you: sketch of a possible felicity in history. Trans. Alison Martin. New York: Routledge, 1996.
    • Strategic engagement with Hegel in which Irigaray appropriates his use of dialectic in order to describe how men and women are both individuals and members of their gender. Also includes an extensive discussion of the language of indirection that Irigaray believes facilitates ethical relationships between men and women.
  • The Irigaray Reader. Ed. Margaret Whitford. Cambridge: Blackwell, 1991.
    • Useful compilation of essays, some of which are found in the texts listed here.
  • Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. New York: Columbia University Press, 1991.
    • One text in Irigaray's elemental series, this text is a strategic engagement with Nietzsche and Derrida on the elision of femininity.
  • Sexes and Genealogies. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. New York: Columbia University Press, 1993.
    • Compilation of essays that address themes as diverse as how to alter the psychoanalytic session to descriptions of the sensible/transcendental.
  • Speculum of the Other Woman. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1985.
    • Irigaray's doctoral dissertation. This text is a complex engagement with the history of philosophy and psychoanalytic theory.
  • The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger. Trans. Mary Beth Mader. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1999.
    • One text in Irigaray's elemental series. This text is a strategic engagement with the philosopher Martin Heidegger.
  • Thinking the Difference: For a Peaceful Revolution. Trans. Karin Montin. New York: Routledge, 1994.
    • Compilation of essays on diverse themes. Similar in structure to je, tu, nous.
  • This Sex Which Is Not One. Trans. Catherine Porter. New York: Cornell University Press, 1985.
    • Compilation of essays that discuss themes as diverse as where Lacanian theory went wrong, what mimesis is, and how to give a Marxist critique of the exchange of women in Western culture.
  • To Be Two. Trans. Monique M. Rhodes and Marco F. Cocito-Monoc. New York: Routledge, 2001.
    • Later work. Further exploration of the question of difference and alterity.
  • To Speak Is Never Neutral. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Sustained discussion of language. Studying the language of both mentally ill and normal subjects, Irigaray argues that language is never deployed in a completely neutral manner.
  • Why Different?. Trans. Camille Collins. Ed. Luce Irigaray and Sylvere Lotinger. New York: Semiotext(e) Foreign Agent Series, 2000.
    • A compilation of interviews with Irigaray about select work written in the 80's and 90's such as Sexes and Genealogies and Language is Never Neutral.

b. Suggested Further Reading

  • Chanter, Tina. Ethics of Eros: Irigaray's Re-Writing of the Philosophers. New York: Routledge, 1995.
    • Thoroughly discusses philosophical influences on Irigaray's work. Argues that comprehending the philosophical influences on Irigaray highlights her innovative ideas about the now passe sex/gender distinction.
  • Cheah, Pheng and Elizabeth Grosz. "The Future of Sexual Difference: An Interview with Judith Butler and Drucilla Cornell." Diacritics, no. 28.1 (1998): 19-41.
    • Highlights central disagreements between prominent feminist thinkers about Irigaray's work.
  • Freud, Sigmund. Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud. Trans. James Strachey in collaboration with Anna Freud. 24 vols. London: Hogarth Press and the Institute of Psychoanalysis, 1953-1974.
  • Freud, Sigmund. The Freud Reader. Ed. Peter Gay. NewYork: W.W. Norton & Co., 1989.
    • Accessible compilation of Freud's work. Of particular interest are "The Ego and the Id," "Femininity," "Mourning and Melancholia," and "Three Essays On The Theory of Sexuality." For unabridged versions of texts, consult the standard edition listed above.
  • Fuss, Diana. Essentially Speaking: Feminism, Nature and Difference. New York: Routledge, 1989.
    • Interesting discussion of strategic essentialism. Includes a discussion of Irigaray, pp. 55-72.
  • Gatens, Moira. Imaginary Bodies: Ethics, Power, and Corporeality. New York: Routledge, 1996.
    • Useful discussion of how the imaginary body plays out at a cultural level.
  • Grosz, Elizabeth. Volatile Bodies: Towards a Corporeal Feminism. Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1994.
    • A central text in philosophy of the body and the overcoming of dualisms.
  • Lacan, Jacques. Ecrits. Trans. Alan Sheridan. New York: W.W. Nortion & Co., 1977.
    • An accessible compilation of key essays in Lacanian thought.
  • Feminine Sexuality. Ed. Mitchell, Juliet and Jacqueline Rose. Trans. Jaqueline Rose. New York: W.W. Norton & Co., 1985.
    • An accessible compilation of key essays by Lacan on feminine sexuality.
  • Lorraine, Tamsin. Irigaray and Deleuze: Experiments in Visceral Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999.
    • Very clear description of difficult aspects of Irigaray's thought. Interesting thesis about connections with Deleuze and Guatarri.
  • Schor, Naomi. "This Essentialism Which is Not One." Ed. Burke, Carolyn, Naomi Schor, and Margaret Whitford. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
    • Very famous and useful discussion of the different kinds of essentialism.
  • Whitford, Margaret. Luce Irigaray: Philosophy in the Feminine. New York: Routledge, 1991.
    • Whitford writes about the psychoanalytic influence on Irigaray's work. Whitford fleshes out Irigaray's appropriation of key psychoanalytic themes and clearly explains complex aspects of Irigaray's work.

Author Information

Sarah K. Donovan
Villanova University
U. S. A.

Feminist Epistemology

Feminist epistemology is an outgrowth of both feminist theorizing about gender and traditional epistemological concerns. Feminist epistemology is a loosely organized approach to epistemology, rather than a particular school or theory. Its diversity mirrors the diversity of epistemology generally, as well as the diversity of theoretical positions that constitute the fields of gender studies, women’s studies, and feminist theory. What is common to feminist epistemologies is an emphasis on the epistemic salience of gender and the use of gender as an analytic category in discussions, criticisms, and reconstructions of epistemic practices, norms, and ideals. While feminist epistemology is not easily and simply characterized, feminist approaches to epistemology tend to share an emphasis on the ways in which knowers are particular and concrete, rather than abstract and universalizable. Feminist epistemologies take seriously the ways in which knowers are enmeshed in social relations that are generally hierarchical while also being historically and culturally specific. In addition, feminist epistemologies assume that the ways in which knowers are constituted as particular subjects are significant to epistemological problems such as warrant, evidence, justification, and theory-construction, as well as to our understanding of terms like “objectivity,” “rationality,” and “knowledge.”

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Critiques of Rationality and Dualisms
  3. Feminist Science Studies
    1. Feminist Naturalized Epistemologies
    2. Cultural Studies of Science
    3. Standpoint Theory
  4. Developmental Psychology, Object Relations Theory and the Question of ‘Women’s Ways of Knowing’
  5. Hermeneutics, Phenomenology, and Postmodernist Approaches
  6. Feminist Epistemic Virtue Theory
  7. Pragmatism and Feminist Epistemologies
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The themes which characterize feminist engagements with epistemology are not necessarily unique to feminist epistemologies, since these themes also crop up in science studies more generally, as well as in social epistemology. Feminist epistemologies are distinctive, however, in the use of gender as a category of epistemic analysis and re-construction. Feminist approaches to epistemology generally have their sources in one or more of the following traditions: feminist science studies, naturalistic epistemologies, cultural studies of science, Marxist feminism and related work in and about the social sciences, object relations theory and developmental psychology, epistemic virtue theory, postmodernism, hermeneutics, phenomenology, and pragmatism. Many feminist epistemological projects incorporate more than one of these traditions. For the sake of this entry, however, particular theorists have been segregated into these fairly arbitrary categories. The caveat here is that each particular theorist might just as well have been included under a number of different categories.

2. Critiques of Rationality and Dualisms

Work by Susan Bordo (1990) and Genevieve Lloyd (1984) analyzes the ways in which metaphors of masculinity operate in constructions of ideals of rationality and objectivity. Drawing on feminist discussions of object relations theory (Bordo) and of the role of the symbolic imaginary and metaphor in modern epistemological projects, both Lloyd and Bordo argue that the operations of the symbolic imaginary are implicated in the metaphysics of subjectivity and objectivity and in the characterization of epistemic problems that follow from that metaphysics. The result of the work done by these feminist historians is that ideals of reason, objectivity, autonomy, and disinterestedness operating in assumptions about inquiry, as well as the idea that the “perennial” problems of epistemology are gender neutral are now revealed to be connected to and constitutive of gender relations.

Bordo’s and Lloyd’s analyses provide resources for feminists working in science studies, as well as those working in Anglo-American analytic traditions. Much of the work in feminist epistemology is influenced by these critiques, and the emphasis that Lloyd especially places on the cognitive role of metaphor, is a starting point for much feminist work on the role of “affective” and “literary” aspects of cognition and philosophy more generally.

Susan Hekman’s (1990) work argues that dualisms of nature/culture, rational/irrational, subject/object, and masculine/feminine underwrite modernist epistemological projects and that feminist epistemology should aim to destabilize and deconstruct those dualisms. Hekman argues that such destablization can only take place if feminists refuse the dichotomous presuppositions of the modernist project, including the dichotomy of masculine/feminine and its role in identity ascriptions. The aim, then, of feminist epistemology is both the eradication of epistemology as a going concern with issues of truth, rationality, and knowledge and the undermining of gender categories.

Critics of feminist epistemology have charged that feminist critiques of rationality amount to a valorization of irrationality, a charge that misses the point of these critiques. If our ideals of rationality are to be interrogated and reconstructed, then, presumably, our ideals of irrationality will be so reconstructed as well, since the operative premise of Bordo’s, Lloyd’s and Hekman’s analyses are that the dichotomy of rationality and irrationality help to constitute the dualism of masculine/feminine and vice-versa. Thus, what critics take to be a valorization of irrationality can only appear so if those dichotomies remain in place.

3. Feminist Science Studies

Much of the initial work in feminist epistemology grew out of feminist critiques of, and engagement with, science. This work generally emphasizes the ways in which science has been marked by gender bias, not only in the fact that women are seriously underrepresented in the sciences, but also in the ways in which assumptions about gendered behavior serve an evidential role in dominant and widely accepted theories in such fields as anthropology, biology, and psychology (Bleier, (1984), Haraway (1988, 1989), Keller (1983, 1984)).

Harding and Hintikka’s (1983) collection represents early work primarily in science studies and epistemology but also includes early work that represents one of the primary and unique contributions of feminist epistemology: the incorporation of moral and political theory in discussions of epistemology and science.

The recognition that the process of scientific theory construction and inquiry essentially involved appeals to extra-scientific values was further developed by subsequent theorists augmenting the early critiques of gender bias in science. Rather than claiming that values and politics always compromised scientific inquiry, feminist theorists such as Nelson (1990), Longino (1990) and Harding (1986, 1991, 1998) argue that such values are always operating in evaluations of evidence, justification, and theory-construction and that trying to develop an epistemology for science that would make it less prone to gender bias requires the recognition of the ways in which values enter the process of scientific reasoning. Feminist theorists, thus, turned their attention to developing epistemologies that would allow for critical evaluation of the values that are shared, and, thus, often invisible, to inquirers in the sciences. Nelson’s work, drawing on Quine, develops a holistic approach to questions about evidence and justification, emphasizing the ways in which knowledge is held by communities, rather than by individual knowers who are abstractable members of such communities. Helen Longino argues for the value of pluralism in the construction of scientific models as a way of making the values and assumptions of scientific communities accessible for critical evaluation. Harding uses Marxist analysis to develop a feminist version of standpoint theory.

What these approaches to feminist science studies emphasize is that good science is not value-free science, since values are ineradicable from the process of scientific inquiry and theory-construction. Instead, they argue that good science is science that can critically evaluate the values and assumptions that operate epistemically in scientific theory construction and in the ways in which scientific problems are formulated. Good science is a science that can develop mechanisms for critically evaluating, not only the results of inquiry, but also the ways in which those results depend upon a raft of value-laden and theory-laden assumptions and facts.

Part of the problem with these approaches (with the exception of standpoint epistemologies, which are discussed in more detail below), however, is that they have few theoretical resources for dealing with questions about how such diversity can be brought into scientific theorizing, and how one could, in principle, exclude groups with commitments or values that are, on the face of it, anti-scientific (e.g. magic) or unpalatable in other ways (e.g. Nazi science). If the value of pluralism is that it would allow for the critical reflection necessary for ensuring that the values and commitments that enter scientific inquiry are visible, then on what grounds could one exclude, for example, creationism? Feminist epistemology that draws on work in science studies has revealed the ways in which it is individuals in communities who know and how such communities operate with a variety of value commitments that make knowledge possible. However, the issue about methodological pluralism remains a difficult one.

a. Feminist Naturalized Epistemologies

Feminist naturalized epistemologies have developed as a way of taking account of the fact that knowers are located in “epistemic spaces” and the ways in which knowledge is more properly understood on a community rather than an individual model. Naturalism is defined here as an approach to epistemology that focuses on causal accounts of knowledge, and in the case of feminist naturalism, these causal accounts also include social, political, and historical factors. Primarily, feminist naturalism seeks to emphasize the ways in which cultural and historical factors can enable, rather than distort, knowledge. Feminist naturalism is itself a rather loosely organized category, with some approaches privileging scientific naturalism and others placing science within the broader scope of human epistemic endeavors. Feminist naturalist approaches by Lynn Hankinson Nelson (1990) and Louise Antony (Antony and Witt 1993) try to develop Quinean naturalism in ways that are consistent with feminist insights about the epistemic relevance of gender and social relations; other feminist epistemologists, such as Elizabeth Potter (1995, 2001), draw on sociological and historical work (in Potter’s case, specifically work on Robert Boyle) to develop naturalistic accounts of theory construction and choice. Work by Alison Wylie (1999) develops feminist naturalistic analyses of the scientific practices of archaeology. The work of Lorraine Code (1987, 1991, 1995, 1996) can also be characterized as a form of feminist naturalized epistemology; this work is discussed in greater detail in the section on Epistemic Virtue Theories below. Nancy Tuana (2003) has developed Charles Mills’s concept of “epistemologies of ignorance” by looking at the ways in which ignorance, rather than knowledge, is constructed by studies of sexuality and public school sex education programs.

Feminist naturalized approaches, like non-feminist naturalized approaches, often come to grief over the status of normativity in the construction of theory, since, traditionally, the naturalistic impulse is to provide a descriptive account of knowledge. However, without an appeal to the ways in which sexism, racism, or homophobia might deform knowledge practices, feminist epistemology would appear to have few resources for arguing that present cultural and historical conditions should be changed, since there is no way to show that these are inherently unreliable or objectionable. Feminist naturalized epistemologies differ in how seriously they take this problem. Some theorists take the challenge presented by this problem very seriously, while others argue that it is only a problem if we assume a strong descriptive/prescriptive or fact/value distinction. Those who take the issue seriously generally offer solutions that either emphasize the value of pluralism in epistemic pursuits or argue that the distinction between the normative and the descriptive is less clear cut than naturalism’s opponents think, thus allowing the feminist naturalist the normative resources that allow for internal critique. Furthermore, feminist naturalists often point out that scientific theories that have been motivated by feminist insights have often turned out to be more empirically reliable than those which claim to be normatively neutral.

b. Cultural Studies of Science

Cultural studies of science begin with the assumption that science is a practice and that practices include both normative and descriptive components that cannot be easily separated from each other. Feminist cultural studies of science emphasize the importance of non-relativistic epistemological commitments and the importance of using revised versions of normative concepts such as “objectivity” and “evidence.” However, they recognize that, insofar as science is a practice, these concepts and their normative import are worked out in practical interactions with the material world, a position that requires that these concepts be revised in ways that are not committed to representational theories of mind and truth. Karen Barad (1999) uses an analysis of the practice of using the scanning tunneling microscope to emphasize the ways in which the boundaries between subject and object are relatively permeable and to show the ways in which observation itself is a form of practice. Her “agential realism” seeks to bridge the gap between descriptive epistemologies and normative epistemologies on the one hand, and between naïve realism and social constructivist approaches to scientific objects on the other.

Donna Haraway’s (1988) work on situated knowledges emphasizes the ways in which science is a rule-governed form of “story-telling” that aims at getting at the truth, but the idea of truth she uses here is not that of reality an sich but a reality that is produced by human material practices. Thus, she argues “facts” are in fact “artifacts” of scientific inquiry. This does not make them false, but it does render them bound up with processes of human production and human needs. Nonetheless, they maintain an ontological independence to a certain extent; this is the central insight of the analogy to other kinds of artifacts.

c. Standpoint Theory

Feminist standpoint epistemology initially developed in the social sciences, primarily in work by Nancy Hartsock (1998) in political science and by Dorothy Smith in sociology. As a methodology for the social sciences, it emphasizes the ways in which socially and politically marginalized groups are in a position of epistemic privilege vis-à-vis social structures. Drawing on Hegel and Marx, feminist standpoint theorists in the social sciences argue that those on the “outside” of dominant social and political groups must learn not only how to get along in their own world, but also how to get along in the dominant society. Thus, they have an “outsider” status with respect to dominant groups that allows them to see things about social structures and how they function that members of the dominant group cannot see.

In philosophy, this theoretical position was developed most thoroughly by Sandra Harding (1986, 1991, 1998). Harding argues that “starting thought out” from the lives of the marginalized will lead to the development of new sets of research questions and priorities, since the marginalized enjoy a certain epistemic privilege that allows them to see problems differently, or to see problems where members of a dominant group do not. However, Harding emphasizes that one need not be a member of a marginalized group in order to be capable of starting one’s thought from that standpoint. She argues that Hegel was not a slave and Marx was not a member of the proletariat, yet they both were able to identify with the standpoint of the slave and with that of the proletariat. Thereby, they were able to start their thought out from lives very different from their own.

The concept of the “standpoint” of the marginalized is both what sets standpoint epistemology apart from a general pluralism as well as the concept that has provided the most challenges to feminist standpoint theorists. One does not occupy the “feminist standpoint,” for instance, simply in virtue of being a woman; the feminist standpoint is an achievement rather than something one is born with. One comes to occupy the feminist standpoint by engaging in critical thought about one’s experience and its relationship to larger social and political structures. By the same token, one need not be a woman in order to occupy the feminist standpoint, since, like Hegel and Marx, one can come to identify with that standpoint. However, the claim that social marginalization confers epistemic privilege seems to depend on a concept of identity that needs to be grounded in the experience of social marginalization, and this has led to charges that standpoint epistemology cannot avoid assuming a great deal of commonality in the experiences of marginalized groups. This has also led to charges that standpoint epistemology must appeal to an “essential” women’s experience or to an “essential” marginalized experience. Such an appeal, implying that there are necessary and sufficient conditions for such experiences, is considered illegitimate by many feminist and postmodernist theorists because they take it to imply that there is something about experience that is “natural” or “given” and that it can serve a foundational role in identity construction. These theorists are suspicious of the claim that there are some experiences that all and only women have that can serve as a basis for identification with that group, arguing that the category of “woman” is either too fractured or too regulative to do the work that feminist standpoint theorists and identity theorists need it to do.

4. Developmental Psychology, Object Relations Theory and the Question of ‘Women’s Ways of Knowing’

Similar charges of “essentialism” have been leveled at feminist epistemologies that draw on developmental psychology and object relations theory to develop epistemic norms. This strand has been more influential in developing feminist moral epistemologies, but it has had some influence on epistemologies developed in tandem with the science studies strain in feminist epistemology as well. Carol Gilligan’s (1982) groundbreaking work in developmental moral psychology in In a Different Voice gave rise to a variety of feminist moral epistemologies that emphasized relatedness and affect to counterbalance the traditional emphasis on moral reasoning as a process of deductive reasoning that takes the reasoner from a moral principle to a particular moral judgment. In a Different Voice raises the issue of whether and how reasoning is tied to the practices of child-rearing, through which children develop gender affiliations and come to live out gendered ideals. Gilligan argues that the moral reasoning processes that take into account relationships in determining the right moral action in a given situation, processes which child development theorists characterized as “immature” or less developed than reasoning processes that operated deductively, are simply complementary and not necessarily inferior. Gilligan’s criticism of Kohlberg’s work, however, ties these reasoning styles to sex: Kohlberg’s studies of moral development and moral reasoning uses boys almost exclusively. The responses that girls give, which often invoke the importance of maintaining relationships when posed with a moral conflict and which emphasize negotiations, are characterized by Kohlberg and his research team as developmentally prior to the deductive reasoning that characterizes the boys’ responses. Gilligan conjectures that girls have more permeable boundaries of the self and are often more concerned with relationship maintenance as a result of their upbringing and that this might account for the different “reasoning styles” that seem to attend gender differences.

Support for this conjecture may be found in object-relations theory. Object relations theory emphasizes the fact that the cognitive distinctions that underlie physical object theory, the process of learning to distinguish between self and other, and the processes of learning language and moral norms all evolve contemporaneously and are tied to each other in a variety of ways such that they re-enforce each other. Coming to learn about objects is connected to coming to learn about what makes one a self and not a thing, and is, thus, connected to theories of mind and intentionality; coming to learn about the persistence of physical objects in time and space depends on developing a sense of an “I” which persists and remains unchanged, even as perceptions change. Feminists emphasize the fact that while all the aforementioned cognitive developments are taking place, the development and re-enforcement of gender ideals and norms is also taking place, overlapping and helping to constitute the cognitive distinctions. Thus, cognitive ideals and virtues come to be saturated with, and partly constitutive of, gender norms and moral norms.

Developmental psychology and object-relations theory, however, are seen by some feminist epistemologists as troublesome, insofar as they assume certain kinds of commonalities in child-rearing that transcend class and race differences. In addition, the claim that women reason differently than men, no matter what the source of that difference, is thought to be both wrong and politically retrograde. However, the virtue of these approaches is that they allow feminist epistemologists to claim that the gender of the reasoner is epistemically significant, which in turn can support the claim that the fact that women are absent from particular studies. Alternatively from the practice of philosophy or science, it means that different ways of thinking about problems or issues may also be missing as a result of that exclusion.

Some of the ways in which the developmental psychology and object-relations strain have contributed to feminist epistemologies in both the sciences and in moral philosophy, however, have relied less on the empirical claims that there are reasoning differences between men and women. These approaches take seriously the ways in which certain aspects of human cognition and reasoning have been tied to women and often devalued as a result, and they take that symbolic relationship as the starting point for epistemic investigation. Along these lines, feminist epistemologists analyze the ways in which testimony operates epistemically while also being embedded in particular social relations that are often opaque to actors and reasoners. Similarly, feminist epistemologies have sought to find a place for affect, relationships, and care in both moral reasoning and in epistemic practices more generally. This branch of feminist epistemology is covered in the section on epistemic virtue theories below.

5. Hermeneutics, Phenomenology, and Postmodernist Approaches

The ways in which Continental philosophical approaches have shaped feminist epistemologies are both complicated and widespread, and even feminist epistemologists who are writing primarily in the Anglo-American tradition have often been influenced by the critical trends in Continental thought. This is true not only of Marxist-feminist epistemologies described above, but it is also true of feminist science studies generally and of feminist epistemologies which draw on developmental psychology and feminist epistemic virtue theory. It is not unusual to find feminist philosophers who are trained primarily in the Anglo-American “analytic” tradition who draw on work in hermeneutics, phenomenology and postmodernism, while feminists who locate their work in these traditions often cross this boundary as well. Similarly, feminist pragmatism (discussed below) often draws on both the Anglo-American analytic tradition and the Continental tradition. It is safe to say that these categories, never stable in non-feminist philosophy, are even more loosely defined in feminist philosophy.

Feminist epistemologies that develop out of the Continental tradition often take as their starting point the need to re-envision and reconstruct the epistemological project more generally. Drawing on Foucault, Gadamer, and Habermas, among others, Linda Martín Alcoff (1993, 1996) argues for a re-orientation of epistemological projects that can take into account the political nature of truth-claims and knowledge production and can provide resources for reconstructing normative epistemic concepts such as rationality, justification, and knowledge.

Continental feminist epistemologies emphasize the ways in which epistemic practices, norms, and products (e.g. knowledge) are not neutral but are, in fact, both produced by, and partly-constitutive of, power relations. However, the claim that knowledge practices and products are not neutral does not amount to the claim that they are false or distorted, since all knowledge practices and products are enmeshed in power relations. The ideal of neutrality, assumed to be essential to good knowledge practices, is, in fact, itself a political construction. Thus, a re-construction of epistemic value terms must be a re-construction that recognizes the political nature of epistemology and epistemic practices. Feminist theorists add to this theoretical approach an emphasis on the ways in which gender is another, and different, layer of power relations.

The other aspect of Continental philosophical traditions that has been used by feminists to introduce and develop an analysis of the epistemic salience of gender has been the phenomenological tradition and its emphasis on the “lived body.” Work by Gail Weiss and Elizabeth Grosz (1994), among others, draws on phenomenology to re-frame epistemological inquiry as well as develops its theory of the body to undermine the oppositional dualisms that Genevieve Lloyd (1984), Susan Bordo (1990), and Susan Hekman (1990) identify as implicated in gender norms and ideals.

Feminist work in the Continental tradition has also led to a critical evaluation of the centrality of epistemology to philosophy and to a concomitant critique of feminists who insist on locating their work in the field of epistemology. A related argument will be addressed below in the section on pragmatist feminist epistemology. The theoretical impetus that comes from the Continental tradition, unlike the one that arises in pragmatism, is connected to the analysis of truth as an instrument of domination, as part of the constitution and maintenance of hegemonic practices, or as a strategic move to eliminate conflict and resistance. This is not a position on which there is agreement among feminist theorists working in the Continental tradition, but the critique of epistemology has been one of the most important developments to come out of feminist engagements with this tradition, and that critique has taken a unique form. Thus, one aspect of feminist Continental epistemology is the attack on epistemology itself, feminist epistemology included.

6. Feminist Epistemic Virtue Theory

Epistemic virtue theories generally focus on the ways in which epistemology and value theory overlap, but feminist versions of these theories focus on the ways in which gender and power relations come into play in both value theory and epistemology and, specifically, on the ways in which subjects are constructed in the interplay of knowledge claims, power relations, and value theory.

Work on the history of philosophy by feminists has led to critiques of philosophical assumptions about what constitutes epistemic virtue, particularly those virtues assumed to be definitive of reason and objectivity. Bordo’s (1990) and Lloyd’s (1984) work examines the ways in which “maleness” and “femaleness” operate symbolically in philosophical discussions of conceptual relationships assumed to be dichotomous, for instance: reason/unreason, reason/emotion, objectivity/subjectivity, and universality/particularity.

These critical engagements with the history of philosophy have laid the groundwork for feminist attempts to reconfigure epistemic virtues in ways that allow for the re-integration of faculties or aspects of knowledge that have been excluded from analyses of epistemic virtue because of their alignment in the “imaginary” of philosophy with women or with the forces of irrationality.

Lorraine Code’s work (1987, 1991, 1995, 1996) argues for the epistemic salience of, among other things, testimony, gossip, and the affective and political operations according to which identities are constructed and maintained. Code and other feminists working in this area emphasize the ways in which social and political forces shape our identities as epistemic authorities and as rational agents and how these, in turn, lead to a different understanding of epistemic responsibility.

Code’s work has also been influential in the development of another strand of feminist epistemology. This strand can be characterized as a version of naturalism [[that]] takes issue with the ways in which traditional epistemological paradigms derive from cases of simple and uncontroversial empirical beliefs. For instance, beliefs like, “I know that I am seeing a tree,” deform the epistemic landscape. This includes a criticism of the paradigm of knowledge as propositional and a related criticism of the presumed individualism of epistemic pursuits. In addition, this naturalistic turn in feminist epistemology takes issue with the traditional epistemological concern with the skeptical problem, in most instances simply ignoring it as an epistemological issue rather than arguing against its importance. The skeptical problem is often taken to be a problem primarily for individualist epistemologies that also assume that knowledge is essentially propositional and that it is to be explained in terms of individual mental states. Since many feminist epistemic virtue theorists reject all or most of these assumptions, the skeptical problem cannot get any traction and is consequently ignored in virtue of its status as a pseudo-problem.

7. Pragmatism and Feminist Epistemologies

For feminist pragmatist approaches, the skeptical problem becomes a non-problem as well, but this is in virtue of the major change wrought in philosophical thinking about knowledge in the wake of Darwin and the pragmatists. Early pragmatists like John Dewey and William James were already recognizing that key terms used in epistemological discourse require revision: terms like “belief” as opposed to “emotion” or “desire,” issues of truth and reference, and representational theories of belief and knowledge are all radically de-stabilized by pragmatist thinkers. Richard Rorty’s development of this theme in the twentieth century led him to conclude that epistemology is dead and that philosophy is the better for it.

Feminist pragmatists share this suspicion of epistemology, although they continue to work on issues related to knowledge. However, theorists like Charlene Haddock Seigfried (1996) argue that since epistemology is importantly tied to terms for which feminist pragmatists have no use, they ought to see themselves as doing something other than epistemology.

Feminist pragmatism has its own version of a naturalized epistemology, but it is a naturalism that, like the naturalism found in feminist epistemic virtue theories, resists reduction to cognitive psychology or neuroscience. Instead, and similar to feminist epistemic virtue theories, it begins with the common problems of knowledge that occur at the crossroads of ordinary experience. Knowledge and its problems present themselves in the same way that other social problems present themselves: as opportunities for melioration and the improvement of life.

The basic epistemic building block for pragmatist feminist approaches is the organism rather than the mind or the body. “Experience” is more complex than sensory states, since it is the way in which the organism interacts with its world, a world that includes not just objects but also social institutions, relationships, and politics. As a result, knowledge pursuits are already implicated with values, politics, and bodies.

Pragmatist feminist approaches to accounts of knowledge, thus, share much with naturalized accounts of epistemology, but the idea of science that operates in feminist pragmatist theories is science as characterized by Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, and John Dewey, rather than the characterization of science as it appears in the analytic tradition of philosophy. There are, of course, differences among Peirce, James, and Dewey in their characterization of science, but it is fair to understand their views as underwritten by an understanding of science as a way of interacting with the world that is also enmeshed in human values and human endeavors. Feminist pragmatist epistemologies share this understanding of science, emphasizing its liberatory project and its role in the melioration of social problems.

Thus, feminist pragmatist epistemological projects attempt to keep our knowledge endeavors true to the liberatory impulse while also re-configuring problems of knowledge in terms that take seriously the insights of evolutionary theory, humanistic empirical psychology, and the understanding of the knowing subject as an organism whose knowledge endeavors are taken up in both a material and a social world.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Alcoff, Linda Martín, Real Knowing (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1996).
  • Feminist coherentist epistemology
  • Alcoff, Linda Martín and Potter, Elizabeth (eds.) Feminist Epistemologies, (New York: Routledge, 1993).
  • Classic anthology
  • Antony, Louise and Witt, Charlotte, (eds.) A Mind of One’s Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1993).
  • Classic anthology
  • Barad, Karen “Agential Realism: Feminist Interventions in Understanding Scientific Practices” in the Science Studies Reader, Mario Biagioli, ed., (New York: Routledge, 1999) pp. 1-11.
  • Benjamin, Jessica The Bonds of Love: Psychoanalysis, Feminism, and the Problem of Domination (New York: Pantheon Books, 1988).
  • Feminist psychoanalytic theory
  • Bleier, Ruth Science and Gender: A Critique of Biology and its Theories on Women (New York: Pergamon Press, 1984).
  • Bordo, Susan, The Flight to Objectivity: Essays on Cartesianism and Culture, (Albany: SUNY Press, 1990).
  • Caine, Barbara, Grosz, E, A., and de Levervanche, Marie, Crossing Boundaries: Feminisms and the Critique of Knowledge, (Boston: Allen and Unwin, 1988).
  • Code, Lorraine, Epistemic Responsibility, (Hanover, NH: University of New England Press, 1987).
  • Feminist epistemic virtue theory
  • Code, Lorraine, What Can She Know? Feminist Theory and the Construction of Knowledge, (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991).
  • Code, Lorraine, Rhetorical Spaces: Essays on Gendered Locations, (New York: Routledge, 1995).
  • Collected essays
  • Code, Lorraine, “What is Natural about Naturalized Epistemology?” American Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 33, no. 1, pp. 1-22 (1996).
  • Duran, Jane, Toward a Feminist Epistemology, (Savage, MD, Rowman and Littlefield, 1991.)
  • Duran, Jane, “The Intersection of Pragmatism and Feminism,” Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy vol. 8 no. 2, pp. 159-71 (1993).
  • Duran, Jane, “The Possibility of a Feminist Epistemology,” Philosophy and Social Criticism, vol. 21, no. 4, p. 127-40 (1995).
  • Gilligan, Carol, In a Different Voice, (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982).
  • Grosz, Elizabeth, Volatile Bodies, (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1994).
  • Gunew, Sneja, ed. Feminist Knowledge: Critique and Construct, (New York: Routledge, 1990).
  • An anthology that includes work from feminists drawing on work in twentieth century French and German philosophy to address feminist epistemological issues
  • Haraway, Donna, “Situated Knowledges: The Science Question in Feminism and the Privilege of Partial Perspective” Feminist Studies 14, 575-99 (1988).
  • Haraway, Donna, Primate Visions: Gender, Race, and Nature in the World of Modern Science, New York: Routledge, 1989).
  • Haraway, Donna, Simians, Cyborgs, and Women: The Reinvention of Nature, (New York: Routledge, 1991).
  • Harding, Sandra, The Science Question in Feminism, (Ithaca: Cornell University Press,1986).
  • Harding, Sandra, Whose Science? Whose Knowledge? (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991).
  • Harding, Sandra, Is Science Multicultural? Postcolonialisms, Feminisms, and Epistemologies, (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1998).
  • Harding, Sandra and Hintikka, Merrill (eds.), Discovering Reality: Feminist Perspectives in Epistemology, Metaphysics, Methodology and Philosophy of Science, (Dordecht: D. Reidel, 1983).
  • Early and classic anthology
  • Hartsock, Nancy, The Feminist Standpoint Revisited and Other Essays, (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1998).
  • Hekman, Susan, Gender and Knowledge: Elements of a Postmodern Feminism, (Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1990).
  • Keller, Evelyn Fox, A Feeling for the Organism, (New York: W. H. Freeman, 1983.)
  • Early classic work on Barbara McClintock
  • Keller, Evelyn Fox, Reflections on Gender and Science, (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1984).
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, The Man of Reason: “Male” and “Female” in Western Philosophy, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984).
  • Longino, Helen, Science as Social Knowledge, (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990).
  • Narayan, Uma, “The Project of Feminist Epistemology: Perspectives from a Non-Western Feminist,” in Gender/Body/Knowledge, Susan Bordo and Allison Jaggar, eds., (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press, 1989), pp. 256-69.
  • Nelson, Lynn Hankinson, Who Knows: From Quine to a Feminist Empiricism, (Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990).
  • Nelson, Lynn and Jack Nelson, (eds.) Feminism, Science, and the Philosophy of Science, (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1996).
  • Potter, Elizabeth, “Good Science and Good Philosophy of Science.” Synthese, 104, p. 423-39, (1995).
  • Potter, Elizabeth, Gender and Boyle’s Law of Gases, (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 2001).
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric, (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996).
  • Tanesini, Alessandra, An Introduction to Feminist Epistemologies (Malden, MA: Blackwell, 1999).
  • Very thorough and useful analyses of different feminist epistemologies
  • Tuana, Nancy, ed., Feminism and Science, (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1989).
  • Tuana, Nancy, “Coming to Understand: Orgasm and the Epistemology of Ignorance,” Hypatia, 19, 1 (2003) pp. 1-35.
  • Tuana, Nancy and Morgen, Sandra, (eds.) Engendering Rationalities, (Albany: SUNY Press, 2001). Multi-disciplinary anthology
  • Webb, Mark Owen, “Feminist Epistemology and the Extent of the Social,” Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy, vol. 10, no. 3, pp. 85-98, (1995).
  • Wylie, Alison, “The Engendering of Archaeology: Refiguring Feminist Science Studies” in Mario Biagioli, (ed.), Science Studies Reader, (New York: Routledge, 1999) pp. 553-568.

Author Information

Marianne Janack
Hamilton College
U. S. A.