Category Archives: Islamic Philosophy

Mulla Sadra (c. 1572—1640)

Mulla Sadra made major contributions to Islamic metaphysics and to Shi'i theology during the Safavid period (1501-1736) in Persia. He started his career in the context of a rising culture that combined elements from the Persian past with the newly institutionalized Shi'ism and Sufi teachings. Mulla Sadra was heir to a long tradition of Islamic philosophy that from the beginning had accommodated the speculations of Greek philosophers, especially Neoplatonic philosophers, for the purpose of understanding the world, particularly in relation to the creator and the Islamic faith. Islamic philosophy originated in the rational endeavours to reconcile reason and revelation though the results did not always satisfy theologians, but ironically widened the gaps between reason and revelation.

Mulla Sadra, too, was deeply concerned about both reason and revelation, and he tried a new way of reconciliation by openly employing a synthetic methodology in which mysticism played an important part. For him and his followers, human knowledge is tenable only as long as it goes back to the indirect grasp of reality which in itself is not subject to conceptualization.  Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra was dedicated to the traditional forms of logical arguments that are based on premises evident to the mind rather than on beliefs which come from religious faith and tradition. For example, his use of Qur'anic verses and religious ideas, though it is an important part of his system, is mainly confined to a secondary or supportive position. As for mysticism, the extensive use of mystical concepts and terminology is acceptable from the point of view of those thinkers who believe that mystical inspiration, intellectual intuition, and revelation, originate in one and the same source, hence their celebration of Mulla Sadra's work as "prophetic philosophy." As a result, the scope of Mulla Sadra's work is wider than his predecessors. In addition to metaphysics, he wrote extensively on the Qur'an and the Tradition and no other major philosopher before him had been so productive in the field of religion.

While focusing on Mulla Sadra's metaphysics including his ontology, epistemology, psychology, this article also brings to light the philosopher's solutions to theological problems. Owing to these solutions, not only did Islamic philosophy manage to survive against religious and political odds, but also Shi'i theology never lost its foothold on the intellectual ground. Although the organic unity of Mulla Sadra's system rests on all the various components of his thought, his independent works on exegesis, mystical treatises, and his commentaries on preceding philosophers, are outside the scope of this article.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Synthetic methodology
  3. Ontology
    1. Primacy of Being
    2. Gradation of Being
    3. The Absolute and the Relational
  4. Epistemology
    1. Mental Being
    2. Unity of the Knower and the Known
  5. Soteriological Psychology
    1. Substantial Motion and the Soul
    2. The End of the Human Soul
  6. Major Theological Issues
    1. The Essence and the Attributes
    2. Temporal Origin of the World
    3. Bodily Resurrection
    4. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood
  7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition
  8. Legacy
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Philosophical Works
    2. English Translation of Primary Literature
    3. Secondary Books in European Languages

1. Biography

Muhammad ibn Ibrahim ibn Yahya al-Qawami al-Shirazi, commonly known as Mulla Sadra, was born and grew up during the golden days of the Safavid period, Iran’s first Shi'ite dynasty (c. 1501-1736). As the only son of a noble family, he received both intellectual and financial support towards a good education that started in his home town, Shiraz, in southeastern Iran. Though Shiraz had a glorious past with regard to philosophy, in Mulla Sadra's day it was not the best place for satisfying his intellectual desire.  In his quest for advanced religious and philosophical training he left Shiraz for Qazvin and then moved to Isfahan where he studied with the most eminent intellectual figures of the day, Mir Damad (d. 1631) and Shaykh Baha'̓i (d. 1576) who were also affiliated with the court of the Safavid King, Shah Abbas I (c. 1587-1629). While Mulla Sadra's philosophical character evolved in conversation and debates with Mir Damad, he owed to Shayk Baha'i his broad knowledge of exegesis (tafsir), tradition (hadith), mysticism (irfan) and jurisprudence (fiqh).  There is yet no historical evidence that he ever studied with Mir Findiriski (d. 1640/1), the other leading intellectual of the time. However, the frequency of associating the two by scholars such as Henry Corbin (d. 1978) suggests an inclination on their part towards providing a perfect picture of the philosopher's integration in the intellectual life of Isfahan with all the pivotal thinkers involved in shaping what has been called "the full flowering of prophetic philosophy" in Mulla Sadra's hands (Nasr 2006).

In 1601, upon the death of his father, Mulla Sadra returned to Shiraz. Later he related his experience during the time spent in Shiraz in a doleful and critical voice denouncing the intellectual atmosphere of the city for being hostile, suppressive, and philistine with regard to philosophy (al-Asfar I 7). He decided to leave Shiraz for a life of solitude and contemplation in Kahak, a quiet village near the city of Qom. The peace and quiet of life in Kahak gave Mulla Sadra the opportunity to start the composition of his most foundational work, al-Hikmat al-muta 'aliya fi'l-asfar al-'aqliyya al-arba (Transcendent Wisdom in the Four Journeys of the Intellect). There he also found some of his life-long students who became well-known scholars of their own time.

This period was followed by several journeys between Shiraz, Isfahan, Qom, Kashan, and most importantly, seven pilgrimages to Mecca. Apparently, this itinerant stage played an important part in his intellectual and spiritual growth that is also suggested by the "journey" metaphor in the title and divisions of al-Asfar. It was also during this period that Mulla Sadra accepted the invitation to teach at Khan School, which was built in Shiraz on the order of the new governor, Allahwirdi Khan, in Mulla Sadra's honour and for the purpose of his lectures.

Mulla Sadra had a family of six children, three sons and three daughters. All his sons became scholars and his daughters were married to three of Sadra's students whom he treated as family even prior to the marriages. We know that two of these students Muhsin Fayz Kashani  (d. 1679/80 ) and Abd al-Razzaq Lahiji (d. 1661/2 ) succeeded their father-in-law as two influential figures of their time though different to him in their philosophical orientation and working under more pressure due to the growing antagonism to philosophy and mysticism under Shah Abbas II (c. 1642-1666).

The intellectual network consisting of Mulla Sadra, his teachers and students that was later dubbed "the School of Isfahan" was formed in a unique political and religious context. Philosophers such as Mir Damad and Mulla Sadra managed to get their voices heard by their contemporaries and posterities in spite of the conservative religiosity of the newly established Shi'ite rule partly owing to the religious and political state of affairs. Since the Safavids strove to establish their identity as a Persian-Shi'ite state in contrast to the Sunni caliphate of the Turks and Arabs, they were in need of philosophy as a stronghold of knowledge that could reinforce, not to say generate, power through systematic thought. At least during the formative and golden days of the Safavid period the attacks on philosophers targeted their Sufi leanings rather than their endeavours to reconcile metaphysics with Shi'ite theology.

A prolific writer, Mulla Sadra composed a large number of treatises on ontology, epistemology, cosmology, psychology, eschatology, theology, mysticism, the Quran and the Tradition. However, many of his philosophical and theological works are repetitions of or elaborations on chapters from his magnum opus al-Hikmat al-mutaliyah fi’l-asfar al-arba‘a al-‘aqliyyah, commonly referred to as al-Asfar that is printed in nine volumes. Rather than simply holding Mulla Sadra's theses, the latter work is an encyclopaedia of different schools of Islamic philosophy and theology. With the exception of Risala-yi si asl (Treatise on the Three Principles) which is in Persian, he wrote all his works in Arabic that was the lingua franca of the Muslim world at that time. He also wrote extensive commentaries on the Qur 'an and the tradition among which respectively al-Mafatihal-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible) and his voluminous commentary on the famous collection of Shi'ite tradition, Usul al-kafi by Kulayni (d.939) are the most important.

After a pious life of dedication to acquiring and expanding philosophy and Islamic sciences, Mulla Sadra died in Basra on the way to his seventh pilgrimage to Mecca. His death was once believed to have occurred in 1640 with his body being buried in Basra. However,  modern scholarship offers new evidence, though not conclusive evidence, in support of the date of 1645 and his burial being in Najaf (Rizvi 2007 30).

2. Synthetic methodology

Mulla Sadra was determined to construct a spacious house of "transcendental philosophy" that could accommodate the apparently conflicting paths in Islamic history towards the ultimate wisdom. He was also heir to a long tradition of philosophy in Persia which had adopted the methodology of Greek philosophy and interpreted it not only in accordance with the Islamic faith, but also implicitly and partly in continuation of the antique Persian traditions. Similar to his past philosophical masters Ibn Sina (d. 1037) and Suhrawardi (d. 1191), but unaware of Ibn Rushd's (d.1198) criticism of Neoplatonism in Islamic philosophy, Mulla Sadra relied on Neoplatonic precepts which had been taken for Aristotelian ideas by preceding philosophers. In particular, he followed Suhrawardi by adopting a holistic method of philosophy in which reason is accompanied by intuition, and intellection is the realization of the quintessence of the human soul, with prophecy (nubuwwa) and sainthood (wilaya) as the noblest manifestations of it.  It is based on this holistic attitude that on the one hand, Mulla Sadra synthesizes the two main schools of Islamic philosophy, namely, the Peripatetic and Illuminationist schools, and on the other hand, bridges the gaps between philosophy, theology, and mysticism. While Mulla Sadra's philosophical methodology is rational in the sense of building his arguments on premises that consist in evident propositional beliefs, he does not reduce philosophical process to mere abstract logical reasoning. The pivotal place of intuition in his philosophical methodology is especially reflected by the influence of Ibn Arabi (d. 1240) throughout his works and by the fact that he regarded Ibn Arabi's writings as having a philosophical character with a "demonstrative force" (al-Asfar I 315). Whether we understand Mulla Sadra's use of intuition as "a higher form of reason" in the Platonic sense (Rahman 1975, 6), or as a prophetic experience that turns philosophy into "theosophy" (Nasr 1997, 57), in reality there is no actual separation between reason and intuition in Mulla Sadra's philosophy. Rather than considering ratiocination (that is, the process of exact thinking) and intuition as independent ways leading to different visions of the truth, for him they merge into one path complementing and completing each other.

Although no Islamic philosopher had ever announced reason and revelation, philosophy and prophecy in conflict with each other, in practice, several philosophical doctrines were regarded by theologians as blasphemous due to contradiction with the theological formulations of Quranic teachings. By synthesizing the findings of his predecessors and relying on his holistic methodology, Mulla Sadra addressed several controversial issues that had opened a wide gap between philosophy and theology, reason and faith. His conciliatory attitude is manifest in his writings that are replete with scriptural and theological references alongside and in harmony with the teachings of Ibn Sina, Suhrawardi, Ibn Arabi, and other Muslim thinkers.

3. Ontology

a. Primacy of Being

Although Aristotle identifies the external existence of a thing with its primary substance, he distinguishes between two questions we can ask with respect to everything: "What it is" and "whether it is (or exists)". This conceptual distinction was later extended to the extra-mental realm of contingent beings by Islamic philosophers, most insistently Ibn Sina, and following him scholastic philosophers such as Aquinas (d. 1274). For Ibn Sina, essence, or quiddity (mahiyya), is universal in the mind while particular in the external world once being is bestowed on it by the Necessary Being who is identified with the God of Abrahamic faith. Except for God who exists in His own right, every other being is composed of essence and being, hence contingent in the sense of dependence on the Necessary Being for their existence.

The distinction was taken for granted after Ibn Sina but turned into a controversial issue when philosophers in the Illuminationist school questioned the external reality of being over and above essence. Suhrawardi and following him Mir Damad argued that being was only a mental construct and the distinction between essence and being was only possible in the conceptual domain. Since then, Islamic philosophers have roughly been categorized as adherents of either the primacy of essence or the primacy of being. Influenced by his philosophy master, Mulla Sadra started as an advocate of essentialism but soon diverged towards the opposite doctrine that he made famous as "the primacy of being" (asalat-i wujud). He built on this foundation the whole of his philosophical system.

Starting with the concept of being, Mulla Sadra attributes two major characteristics to it. Firstly, being is beyond logical analysis, hence indefinable, due to its simplicity and supra-categorical status. It is self-evident and prior to any other concept in the mind. Secondly, it is a univocal concept in the sense that it has one and the same meaning in all its applications, whether we apply it to God or to any other entity. The first characteristic seems to place being as such totally outside the grasp of discursive thought. The second one leaves the philosopher with the hope that in case he finds an alternative path towards being, he will be able to bridge the ontological gap made by certain theologians between the Creator and the created.

As for the reality of being in the external world, Mulla Sadra not only follows Ibn Sina in considering being as a reality, but adheres to his other master, Ibn'Arabi in considering being as the only reality, the doctrine which is commonly referred to as "the unity of being" (wahdat al-wujud). Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra's ontological monism does not imply that essences are illusions, as it is held in radical forms of Sufism. For Mulla Sadra, though essences are not genuine in their existence, they still exist as delimitations of the Real Being that is the ground of all that exists. Using a poetic analogy, the indefinite Reality is a colorless light while essences are the colourful glasses through which the single light appears as diverse phenomena. Conceptual differentiation, without which thinking and speaking would be impossible, is owing to this semi-reality of essences. To sum up, while being is the principle of unity, essence or quiddity is the principle of difference.

Mulla Sadra has several arguments for the primacy of being and its unrivalled reality. The most comprehensive list of the arguments appears in his al-Mashair, a useful summary of his ontology, and several arguments are included in al-Asfar. For the premises of his arguments, Mulla Sadra relies on the classical understanding of essence as a universal without external effects within the mind. On this ground, the real horse can give you a ride while the universal horse in the mind is incapable of that because real particularity, external properties and real effects are owing to being and cannot be in the mind. In conclusion, being is the ground of reality, or better to say, reality itself, while essence only belongs to the conceptual realm and as Mulla Sadra put it "the term 'existent' is applied to essence only with respect to its relation to being [itself]" (al-Asfar VI 163).

b. Gradation of Being

The univocal concept of being applies to its instances in the same sense because of the unity of its reality, and conceptual differences are only due to essences. On the other hand, essences have no reality of their own. Based on these two premises, one could conclude that diversity is not real. Gradation, or modulation, of being (tashkik al-wujud) is Mulla Sadra's way to avoid this counterintuitive result and to create a system in which the monistic worldview of Sufism is reconciled with the realistic pluralism of classical philosophy and our common sense. According to this doctrine, though one simple reality, being comes in grades, in a similar way that sunlight and candlelight are the same reality of different grades. In effect, there are only differences by degrees, while essences, as concepts in the mind, reflect gradations as contrasts. As Mulla Sadra put it,

The instances of being are different in terms of intensity and weakness as such, priority and posteriority as such; nobility and baseness as such, although the universal concepts applicable to it and abstracted from it, named quiddities, are in contrast essentially, in terms of genus, species, or accidents. (al-Asfar IX 186)

Before Mulla Sadra, Suhrawardi introduced the concept of gradation into the logic of definition and considered essence as capable of applying to instances by different degrees. For example, he regarded a horse more of an animal than a fly. His ontology was based on light as the hierarchical reality of universe with realms of existence as different ranks of it. Inspired by Suhrawardi's challenge of classical philosophers such as Ibn Sina who would not allow gradation in the same essence, but in contrast to the former's belief in the ontological primacy of essence or quiddity, Mulla Sadra replaced the hierarchical light of Suhrawardi with the hierarchical being. Accordingly, Reality is one and the same thing but possessed of different degrees of intensity, which justifies diversity within unity.

The doctrine of gradation not only supports the reality of diversity, but also points out the all-encompassing simplicity of being qua being. Hence the famous dictum that is frequently repeated in Mulla Sadra's works, "the Simple Reality (basit al-haqiqa) is all things but none of those things in particular" (al-Asfar VI 111).

c. The Absolute and the Relational

Given that for Mulla Sadra reality consists in different grades of the same being, the nature of causality becomes an urgent question for him. Mulla Sadra's formulation of causality reveals the strong influence of Ibn Arabi's unity of being (wahdat al-wujud). Mulla Sadra begins with causality in the sense of existentiation (ijad) according to which contingent essences are brought into existence once their existence is necessitated by the Necessary Being. However, since in Mulla Sadra's system, essences only belong in the conceptual domain, the relationship between cause and effect cannot be explained based on the metaphysical duality of being/essence. Therefore, he finally replaces this duality by the distinction he makes between two senses of being, the independent and the relational. At the cosmic level, the only independent being is the Absolute Being, while the rest, no matter of what intensity, are only relational.

Mulla Sadra's introduction of this distinction into Islamic philosophy was inspired by the linguistic division between the meaning of "to be" in the sense of existence as a real predicate, and "to be" as a copula, the latter being nonexistent as a word in Arabic and only suggested though predication. Relational being is a "being-in-another" in the sense of being nothing other than a relation to another being. For example, in saying that "snow is white", the predicative relation that is expressed by "is" has no existence apart from "snow" and "white". Mulla Sadra regards all beings as nothing but an existential relation to the Absolute Being. For Him, "He is the Truth and the rest are His manifestations. He is the Light and the rest are the streaks of that Light…" (al-Masha’ir 450).

4. Epistemology

Mulla Sadra's epistemology is not prior to but based on his findings about the nature of reality. Though this may sound like begging the question from the perspective of modern philosophy, it is consistent with the totality of Mulla Sadra's system in which everything including knowledge itself is a form of being. It is for this reason that he studies knowledge as a subject of first philosophy, namely, the study of being qua being. He diverges from what he criticises in Ibn Sina as the negative process of abstraction (al-Asfar III 287) in favour of the positive presence of noetic or mental beings in the mind. For Mulla Sadra, knowledge is the realization of an immaterial being which corresponds to the extra-mental reality because it is the higher grade of the latter being.

Mulla Sadra's main contribution to Islamic epistemology lies in his diversion from the Aristotelian dualism of subject and object, in other words, knower and the known (̒aqil wa ma'quil). He rejected the dominant theory of knowledge as the representation of the abstracted and universal form of particular objects to the mind. This innovation, though on a different ground and based on a different foundation, is comparable to the 20th century efforts made in the area of phenomenology and existentialism to get over the epistemological scepticism resulting from Cartesian dualism.

a. Mental Being

In classical Islamic epistemology knowledge is divided into "knowledge by presence" that consists only in the immediate access of the soul to itself in the sense of self-consciousness, and "knowledge by acquisition" that originates in sense perception and provides the subject with an abstracted representation of the external objects, that is, the intelligible universal at the level of intellect. In line with the Neoplatonic trend of thought adopted by Suhrawardi, Mulla Sadra replaced representation by direct presentation (hudur). For Mulla Sadra, all knowledge is, at bottom, knowledge by presence because our knowledge of the world is a direct access to what is called mental beings.

In contrast to the Peripatetic mental form or concept as a universal produced by abstraction, mental being is an immaterial and particular mode of existence with a higher intensity than the external object corresponding to it. According to Mulla Sadra, mental being is the key to the realization of all levels of knowledge including sense perception, imagination, and intellection. Upon encounter with the external world, the soul creates mental beings in a similar manner that God creates the world of substantial forms both material and immaterial (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 43). Thus, rather than correspondence between the external object and its represented form in the mind, for Mulla Sadra the credibility of knowledge lies in the existential unity of  different grades of the same being, one created by the soul and the other existing in the external world.

Although the human soul has the potentiality of creating modes of existence also in the absence of the matter, as in the case of miracles, for the average human soul, as long as she lives in the material world, contact with matter is necessary for activating the creative process of generating mental beings. In this respect, Mulla Sadra's epistemology should not be conflated with subjective idealism in that for him the physical being is a reality though of a lesser intensity than its counterpart in the soul.

b. Unity of the Knower and the Known

Mulla Sadra revolutionized epistemology with regard to the relationship between the knowing subject and her object based on the doctrine of the unity of the knower and the known previously held by the Neoplatonic Porphyry (d. 305) but strongly rejected by Ibn Sina.  Siding with the former, Mulla Sadra redefines the status of knowledge. Previously, mental form was defined as a psychic quality that occurs to the immaterial substance of the soul as a mere accident (̒arad), incapable of making any changes to the soul's essence. Conversely, for Mulla Sadra, knowledge that is made up of mental beings functions as a substantial form that actualizes the potential faculties of the soul. Similar to form and matter in the physical world, there is no real separation between the knower (soul or mind) and the immediately known object of it, that is, the mental being. To put it in a nutshell, knowledge is a single reality that, in its potentiality, is called "the knower" ('lim) or "the intellect" ('aqil) while in its actuality, it is "the known" (ma'lum) or the "intelligible" (ma'quil). Owing to this unity, rather than being a fixed substratum for accidental mental forms, the mind in its reality is identical to the sum of all the mental beings that are realized in it. In other words, there is no such thing as an actual mind in the absence of knowledge.

This existential unification holds at all the levels of knowledge that is confined by Mulla Sadra to sense perception, imagination, and intellection. The faculty of sense perception is a potentiality of the soul that is unified with the perceptible forms (or beings) in the occasion of contact with the sensible world. Once sensible forms (beings) are realized, a higher grade of mental beings called "the imaginal beings" are actualized in unity with the imaginative faculty of the soul. The same unification holds at the level of intellection between the intelligible forms (beings) as the actual and the intellect as potential. From this level, the human soul is capable of acquiring higher degrees of knowledge that prepares her for the final unification with the Active Intellect that is the reservoir of all knowledge, and as a result, the activator of the human mind during the creative process of knowledge formation. This epistemic elevation is at the same time the journey of the soul towards higher grades of being and spiritualization.

5. Soteriological Psychology

In the pre-modern context, one should understand the term "psychology" in the sense of inquiry into the nature and mechanism of the metaphysical soul in its relation to the body. Moreover, informed by the Islamic doctrines and inspired by mysticism, Islamic philosophers regarded the human soul as capable of elevation through acquiring knowledge and spiritual practice. Mulla Sadra's psychology is not an exception to this tradition; however, in his system, the human soul is given a more dominant role within the cosmic drama that unfolds along a salvific process of perfection.

a. Substantial Motion and the Soul

Mulla Sadra describes the soul as one simple but graded reality that in its unity includes diverse mental faculties. He also regards the soul as bodily in its origin, but spiritual in subsistence. This picture of the soul's substance is unprecedented in the philosophy before Mulla Sadra. It is built on the doctrine of substantial motion that is one of the hallmarks of transcendental philosophy. According to this doctrine, all nature, including substances and accidents, is in motion. As bodily in its origin, the soul too moves from one form to another as long as it is living in this world. The substance of the soul is an existentially graded reality in which the changes take place through the superimposition of one form over the previous one rather than one replacing the other. Therefore, the unity of the soul is maintained despite the changes and her identity is preserved.

Though starting from the Aristotelian view of the soul as the form of the body, in his psychology, Mulla Sadra departs from the former in attributing to the human soul the power of growing out of the bodily attachment. Along with the expansion of knowledge and spiritual evolvement, the soul moves up to higher grades of being. The rational human soul is actualized when we reach maturity (around the age of forty), but this is not the end. At this stage, we are actually human but potentially angels or devils. 

b. The End of the Human Soul

For Mulla Sadra, the ultimate happiness of the human souls is to join in the beatific life of the Intellects. This is in agreement not only with Aristotle's definition of happiness, but also with a Neoplatonic doctrine according to which the individual souls are only particular determinations of the universal soul that descends to the imperfect level of nature by joining the bodies. Therefore, the individual human soul, though starting as a bodily being in the world, is still invested with an otherworldly spirituality due to the noble state of the universal soul before the descent. The inherent inclination toward reunion with the Active Intellect, that is, the realm of Divine Knowledge, puts the soul back on the "arch of ascent". However, the ascent toward reunion is not guaranteed for each and every human soul since there are many phases that each soul should pass successfully in order to substantially evolve and reach up to higher ranks of being.

Mulla Sadra's delineation of the soul's journey resonates with ideas of Islamic mysticism which in turn is indebted for its theoretical formulation to Neoplatonic ideas. The title of his magnum opus, al-Asfar, together with its main divisions is a proof to the mystical attachment as the philosophical narrative unfolds in terms of the famous four journeys of the soul, namely, the quest in search of the ultimate Truth or God and the final reunion with Him. In al-Asfar, the first journey that is from the created to the Creator is devoted to the concept and reality of being. The second journey is from the Creator to the Creator through the Creator, and discusses essence. The third journey is from the Creator to the created with the Creator and is about God and His Attributes, and finally the journey from the created to the created with the Creator that is focused on the destiny of the humankind.

Furthermore, Mulla Sadra explains the afterlife of the human soul based on Ibn'Arabi's metaphysics of imagination that introduces the imaginal world (̒alam al-mithal) in between the Intellectual realm on top and the material world at the bottom. In line with Ibn'Arabi and Suhrawardi, while in contrast to Ibn Sina, Mulla Sadra believes in a bipartite reality of imagination according to which imaginative forms can exist both as subjective, or attached to the human mind, and as objective, or independent, comprising the detached domain of imagination, that is, the imaginal world. The creative imagination of the human soul, which is the source of prophecy and miracles in this world, is also the key to the bodily resurrection of the soul in the next world. While in this world only the prophets and saints are capable of bringing their imagination into life, in the next world where the material bodies are no more existent, every soul will be capable of creating her imaginal body.

The bodily resurrection of the soul should not be conflated with any forms of reincarnation which is strongly rejected by Mulla Sadra. He uses the analogy of "reflections in the mirror" (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya, 126) to show the necessary correlation between the otherworldly body and the spiritual grade of the individual soul. Rather than transmigrating into another body, the soul creates its very own body that becomes an objective image of her intentions and deeds in the previous life. That is the reason why the lesser souls will be resurrected as animals while the noble ones will simply join in the life of Intellect with no bodies at all. Thus, the hierarchy of resurrected souls in the next world corresponds to the hierarchy of souls in this world. There is a subtle problem here concerning the nature of imagination and the "mirror-like" nature of the soul in terms of eschatology. Mulla Sadra's use of mirror imagery with respect to other-worldly bodies is his response to Suhrawardi on the same issue and draws on the endeavours of Ibn'Arabi and his commentator Dawoud al-Qaysari (d. 1350) to solve an earlier problem in Islamic philosophy (Rustom 2007).

6. Major Theological Issues

Islamic philosophy is rooted in the early endeavours of Mu'tazilite theologians who borrowed the instrument of Greek logic and terminology in order to formulate the doctrines of faith in a manner palatable for human reason. Of primary importance was proof to the existence and oneness of God, the nature and function of His Attributes, and the nature and mechanism of prophecy. Not only have different schools of theology offered divergent solutions to theological problems, but also theology has been in conflict with philosophy over several key issues. One of the novelties of Mulla Sadra's work was the systematic effort to resolve long-held conflicts between philosophers and theologians. Moreover, unlike his philosophical predecessors, he did not leave any religious doctrine to mere faith and believed in the possibility of rational explanation for all. His proof for the doctrine of bodily resurrection is a good example of this positive attitude. On the whole, Mulla Sadra does not see a chasm between philosophy and theology; rather, his theology is both the continuation and the ultimate result of his philosophical doctrines.

Mulla Sadra dismissed all the previous proofs to the existence of God as resting on wrong assumptions, or at best insufficient. He even criticised Ibn Sina's "proof of the righteous" (al-Asfar VI 13) because of its reliance on the concept rather than the reality of being. However, Mulla Sadra's proof, which he calls by the same name, shares the a priori character of Ibn Sina's proof. An a priori proof (burhan-i limmi) does not infer the existence of the Creator (cause) from the existence of any particular created thing (effect). For Mulla Sadra, the "proof of the righteous" is called by this name because it has the privilege of arguing for the existence of God through God Himself. Based on Mulla Sadra's ontology, the reality of being is necessary, and it is of different grades. The delimited and imperfect grades do not exist in their own right, but only as relations to the most perfect or Absolute Being. Therefore, the Absolute Being or God must necessarily exist. Starting from the reality of being, this argument infers the existence of God from God Himself because "the real being and the Necessary Being apply to the same thing", that is, God (al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma'ad 30).

As for the oneness of God (tawhid), that is, the first article of faith in Islam, Mulla Sadra further relies on his ontological views to argue against both the intrinsic and extrinsic plurality with respect to God. His argument is based on the transcendental inclusiveness of the Absolute Being. God as the Absolute Being is a simple reality in the sense of being without parts while including all things. As the most intense and the only independent being, God is inclusive of every form of existence while excluding only the imperfections and contingencies. Therefore, to assume another being next to God would be logically absurd. In Mulla Sadra, the theological doctrine of Divine Oneness can be identified with the mystical-philosophical doctrine of the oneness of being that is the only way in which the oneness of God can be understood without wrongly imagining it as a numerical concept.

a. The Essence and the Attributes

The simplicity of the Absolute Being in the sense of being comprehensive of all is also the key to explaining God's Attributes in relation to each other and to the Essence (dhat). Though the Attributes must be infinite in number and scope, human beings only know of a limited number of them through the Qur'an. The nature of Divine Attributes has been a subject of controversies between different theological schools. They differ over the objectivity of the Attributes in the sense of independence from God's Essence. In al-Asfar and al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma 'ad, Mulla Sadra has elaborated on several Attributes including Life, Knowledge, Will, Speech, Vision and Hearing. He tries to prove the reality of the Attributes in a way that would not defy the unity of God's Essence. He resolves this theological paradox of diversity in unity with regard to God's Essence by resorting to the simple reality of God's Being. In a similar way to the unity of the soul with the diverse psychic properties like knowledge and will, all the Attributes of God are not only unified with the Essence, but unified with each other. The corollary to this conclusion is that, in its ontological unity with the infinite and necessary Reality of God, each Attribute must be infinite and necessary. For example, God has necessary and infinite knowledge of all. According to Mulla Sadra, God knows the world through the knowledge of Himself and as his Essence includes all, he has knowledge of all without any limits. Nevertheless, the objects of divine knowledge exist at the level of Essence in a state of existential togetherness (wujud al-jam'i) with a higher grade of being than their existence as distinct essences in the created world. This is the way Mulla Sadra tried to resolve a long-held conflict between philosophy and theology regarding God's detailed knowledge of the world. In a similar fashion, Mulla Sadra redefines other Attributes of God in the context of transcendental philosophy with the hope of reconciling philosophy with theology.

b. Temporal Origin of the World

One of the earliest and harshest theological indictments of Islamic philosophy was carried out by the Ash'arite theologian, Abu Hamid Muhammad ibn Muhammad al-Ghazzali, (d. 1111) in his al-Tahafat al-falasifa (The Inconsistency of Philosophers). One of the most important faults he finds in philosophers such as Ibn Sina is the doctrine of the eternity of creation. According to this doctrine that was accepted by all Peripatetic philosophers the universe was created in eternity, which means that creation had no beginning in time. This doctrine has been criticised by theologians due to its conflict with the scriptural picture of creation, both in the Bible and the Qur'an.

Mulla Sadra takes a middle path between reason and revelation by resorting to his doctrine of substantial motion. According to Mulla Sadra, every particle of nature is in constant motion along their timeline which he regards as the fourth dimension of the bodily substance. Motion is not an accidental property given to nature over and above its substance; rather, it is essential to it and caused at the same 'time' with the creation of the bodily substance. Motion is by definition temporal, and substantial motion is the renewal of every particle of nature in time. Thus, Mulla Sadra concludes that every particle of nature is being recreated at every moment, which is the meaning of temporal origination. The world as a whole is nothing more than its parts, so the origination of the whole world in time is an absurd question.

c. Bodily Resurrection

Bodily resurrection is an article of Islamic faith that is regarded by theologians as a requisite for the fulfilment of the scriptural promises and threats regarding reward and punishment in the next world. As a theological issue, bodily resurrection has caused serious conflicts between philosophy and theology particularly following Ghazzali's criticism of Ibn Sina on this issue. According to Ibn Sina, bodily resurrection is a matter of faith that Muslims must believe in, but from a logical point of view, it is impossible.

Mulla Sadra follows Ghazzali in holding that scepticism over bodily resurrection is not acceptable from either the religious or logical point of view (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya 125). However, he reinterprets bodily resurrection in terms of the imaginative creation of the otherworldly body by the soul. Though immaterial, the imaginal body is possessed of the three dimensions of the physical body that make it subject to a variety of feelings similar to our dream-world experiences. This will especially serve the purpose of punishment for the imperfect souls who spoiled the prospect of an intellectual/heavenly life through their carnal obsessions in the previous world. Some souls may be pardoned after serving their time in Hell by God's Grace and the intermission of angels and nobler souls. As for the others, they will stay in Hell with their imaginal bodies forever. Despite his efforts, Mulla Sadra's picture of resurrection is not in complete conformity with that of theology. Especially, his intellectual Paradise is not different to that of the classical philosophers. Great souls are not satisfied with carnal pleasures even in this world, so their reward in the next world cannot be a carnal one.

d. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood

Influenced by Ibn 'Arabi's doctrine of "the Perfect Human" and its incorporation into Shi'i imamate by Sayyid Haydar Amuli  (d. 1385), Mulla Sadra explains prophethood, imamate, and sainthood as related aspects of the same reality. Prophets, Imams, and Saints are instances of the category of the Perfect Human (al-insan al-kamil) whose soul is inclusive of the three levels of creation, that is, the intellectual, the imaginal, and the sensory worlds. Mulla Sadra, regards prophethood as "exoteric guidance" (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 492) which is necessary for the average people. Intellectual truths that are revealed to prophets through the unification of their intellect with the Angel of revelation, identical to the Active Intellect of philosophy, descend to the level of imagination and sense perception in order to be communicated to the people.

The esoteric side of prophecy is not only the innermost spiritual meaning of it, but also the purpose of creation. Although Muslims believe that Muhammad was the last prophet of God, according to Mulla Sadra, after the death of Muhammad, revelation continued in the form of inspiration that endows the Imam and Saint with the same infallibility as the Prophet.  Thus, the content of the divine communication is the same in all three, but the form is slightly different. Prophets have a clearer vision of the Angel of revelation in comparison to the Imams and Saints (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 480).

7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition

In many cases philosophers have resorted to the Qur’an in order to reinforce their philosophical arguments. On the other hand, there is a long tradition of Qur'anic exegesis ranging from technical linguistic analysis to rational and esoteric hermeneutics (ta'wῑl) that comprises a sophisticated and independent discipline. Mulla Sadra is a special case as a philosopher who has dedicated independent treatises to Qur'anic commentaries. Moreover, there is a mutual reinforcement between his philosophy and his reading of the Qur'an in the sense that not only his approach to the Qur'an is philosophical, but also his philosophy has a Qur’anic base (Rustom 2012). Mulla Sadra does not see any conflicts between the teachings of the Qur'an and his philosophical system. Apart from several commentaries on chapters and verses from the Qur'an, Mulla Sadra also wrote about the theoretical and practical criteria of exegesis. His major theoretical work is Mafatih al-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible).

As for Mulla Sadra's work on the tradition (hadith), his monumental commentary on al-Usul al-kafi by Kulayni  is the most important. Kulayni's work is the first Shi‘i collection of Hadith and focuses on theology and jurisprudence. It has served as a textbook at the religious seminaries around the Shi'i world for centuries, and Mulla Sadra's commentary on this work has secured him a good place among the experts in Hadith scholarship.

8. Legacy

Mulla Sadra's influence on his immediate students, including his sons-in-law, Fayz Kashani and Lahiji, owed more to the mystical aspect of his works. As for his philosophical doctrines, he was only followed by the less famous among his students such as Husayn Tunikabuni  (d.1693). Especially, in the late Safavid period due to the intellectually suppressive atmosphere created by influential clerics, most prominently Muhammad Baqir Majlisi (d. 1198), philosophical and particularly mystical thoughts were antagonized by the ruling system and the clerics alike.

Nevertheless, the legacy of the philosopher was kept alive until, in the Qajar period (c. 1785-1925), a more welcoming attitude facilitated the revival of his works in the hands of his followers who worked as Sadrian scholars. In addition to editing and expounding the latter's works, as teachers they also initiated a chain of scholars that has continued until today. Among contemporary scholars and Sadrian philosophers, Muhammad Husayn Tabataba'i (d. 1981) is one of the most widely read. His books, which are based on Mulla Sadra's philosophy with some modifications, are still being taught as compendiums of Islamic philosophy at the departments of philosophy in Iran. Mulla Sadra studies particularly flourished after the Islamic Revolution of 1979. Since then, he has been widely taught both at the religious seminaries and universities with governmental funds supporting the foundation of institutes and international conferences. Among these, Sadra Islamic Philosophy Research Institute, established in 1994 in Tehran, and the World Congress on Mulla Sadra in 1999 are the best examples.

After Mulla Sadra’s death, India was the first place outside Iran to show his influence. A remarkable number of expositions and commentaries have been written on one of his marginal works called Commentary on Sharh al-Hidayah in India where it has been taught as a course book of Islamic philosophy for several centuries. Later, the Shi'i seminaries of Iraq in the city of Najaf and some influential thinkers in Pakistan also welcomed Mulla Sadra's philosophy.

Mulla Sadra was introduced into the West at the end of the nineteenth century by the German orientalist, Max Horten (d. 1945) with an emphasis on the mystical aspect of the philosopher's work. Later during 1960's and 70's, the collaboration of the French scholar Henry Corbin (d. 1978) with Toshihiko Izutsu (d.1986 ) from Japan and Seyyed Hossein Nasr (b. 1933) from Iran, led to a full-fledged introduction of Mulla Sadra into Western academia as part of a wider project of reviving "perennial wisdom". Following their work, Mulla Sadra has been translated, taught, and discussed in academic journals and circles both in Europe and North America. The contemporary generation of Mulla Sadra scholars, though approaching Mulla Sadra from different points of view, are illuminating various aspects of the philosopher's work.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Philosophical Works

  • Mulla Sadra, Risala-yi si asl. Seyyed Hossein Nasr (ed.). (Tehran: Mulla Sadra Research Institute, 1381AH solar).  
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-muta'aliya fi asfar al-aqliya al-arba'a. 5. Muhammad Reza Muzaffar (ed.). 9 vols. (Beirut: Dar al-ihya ' al-turath al-Arabi, 1999).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-'Arshiyya. Ghulam Ahani (ed.). (Isfahan: Isfahan University press, 1340 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh al-Hidaya.Ahmad Shirazi (ed.). (Facsimile repr. Qom: Intishsrat-i Bidar. 1313 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mabda' wa'l-ma'ad. Ahmad Hosseini Ardakani (ed.). (Tehran: Sitad-i Inqilab-i Farhangi, Markaz-i Nashr-i Danishgahi, 1983).
  • Mulla Sadra, Tafsir al-Qur’an al-karim. M. Khajavi (ed.). 7 vols. (Qom: Intisharat-i Bidar, 1988).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya. 3. Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1387 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Shawahid al-rububiyya. Javad Mosleh (trans.). (Tehran: Soroush Press, 2006).
  • Mulla Sadra, Majmu'a-yi rasa'il-i falsafi-yi Sadr al-muta'allihin. Hamid Naji Isfahani (ed.). (Tehran: Hikmat, 1385AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Masha'ir.Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1386 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Mafatih al-ghayb. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). (Beirut: Mu 'assasat al-Tarikh al-Arabi, 2002 rpt).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh-i Usul al-Kafi. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). 4 vols. (Tehran: Pizhuhishgah-i Ulūm-i Insani va Mutala'at-i Farhangi, 2004).

b. English Translation of Primary Literature

  • Mahdi Dasht Bozorgi and Fazel Asadi Amjad, Divine Manifestations: Concerning the Secrets of the Sciences of Perfection (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • William Chittick, The Elixir of the Gnostics (Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2003).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • T. Kirmani, The Manner of the Creation of Actions (Tehran: SIPRIn, 2004).
  • J. Lameer, Conception and Belief in Sadr al-Din Shirazi (Tehran: Iranian Academy of Philosophy, 2005).
  • Parviz Morewedge, The Metaphysics of Mulla Sadra: The Book of Metaphysical Prehensions (New York: Society for the Study of Islamic Philosophy and Science, 1992).
  • James Morris, The Wisdom of the Throne (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1981).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr and Ibrahim Kalin, Metaphysical Penetrations: A Parallel English-Arabic Text by Mulla Sadra (Provo: Brigham Young Press, 2013).
  • Latimah Peerwani, On the Hermeneutics of the Light Verse of the Qur 'an (London: ICAS Press, 2004).
  • Colin Turner, Challenging Islamic Fundamentalism: The Three Principles of Mulla Sadra (London: Routledge, 2011).

c. Secondary Books in European Languages

  • Alparslan Açikgenç, Being and Existence in Sadra and Heidegger: A Comparative Ontology (Kuala Lumpur: International Institute of Islamic Thought and Civilization, 1993).
  • Reza Akbarian, The Fundamentals of Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Reza Akbarian, Islamic Philosophy: Mulla Sadra and the Quest of “Being” (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Cécile Bonmariage, Le Réel et les réalités: Mulla Sadra Shirazi et la structure de la réalité (Paris: Vrin, 2008).
  • Maria Massi Dakake,"Hierarchies of Knowing in Mulla Sadra's Commentary on Usul al-Kafi." Journal of Islamic Philosophy 6 (2010).
  • Mahdi Dehbashi, Transubstantial Motion and the Natural World (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Max Horten, Das philosophische System von Schirázi (Strasbourg: Trübner, 1913).
  • Christian Jambet, The Act of Being: The Philosophy of Revelation in Mulla Sadra. Jeff Fort (trans.). (New York: Zone Books, 2006).
  • Christian Jambet, Mort et résurrection en islam: L’audelàselon Mulla Sadra (Paris: Albin Michel, 2008).
  • Christian Jambet, Se rendre immortel (Saint Clémentde Rivière: Fata Morgana, 2002).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal. From Essence to Being: The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra and Martin Heidegger (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal, Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006).
  • Sayeh Meisami, Mulla Sadra (Oxford: Oneworld, 2013).
  • Mahmoud Khatami, From a Sadrean POint of View: Toward an Ontetic Elimination of the Subjectivistic Self (London: London Academy of Iranian Studies, 2004).
  • Megawati Moris, Mulla Sadra’s Doctrine of the Primacy of Existence ( KualaLumpur: ISTAC, 2003).
  • Zailan Moris, Revelation, Intellectual Intuition and Reason in the Philosophy of Mulla Sadra: An Analysis of the al-Hikmahal‘Arshiyyah (London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2002).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr, Sadr al-Din Shirazi and His Transcendent Theosophy. 2nd ed. (Tehran: Institute for Humanities and Cultural Studies, 1997).
  • Fazlur Rahman, The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1975).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra Shirazi: His Life and Works and the Sources for Safavid Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra and Metaphysics: Modulation of Being (London: Routledge, 2009).
  • Mohammed Rustom, "Psychology, Eschatology, Imagination, in Mulla Sadra Shirazi's Commentary on the Hadith of Awakening," Islam & Science, vol 5 (summer 2007) No 1.
  • Mohammed Rustom, The Triumph of Mercy: Philosophy and Scripture in Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2012).
  • Mahdi Ha'iri Yazdi, The Principles of Epistemology in Islamic Philosophy: Knowledge by Presence (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992).


Author Information

Sayeh Meisami
Queen’s University School of Religion

Ikhwan al-Safa'

Ikhwān al-safā’ (the Brethren of Purity) are the authors of the Rasā’il al-Ikhwān al-safā’ (Treatises of the Brethren of Purity), an Islamic encyclopedia consisting of fifty-two treatises and an additional comprehensive treatise (Risālat al-jāmi‘a) on various philosophical sciences interpreted by Ismā‘īlī Shī‘ī scholars. It covers the mathematical, natural, psychological/rational, and theological sciences and was written in the tenth or eleventh century C.E. The Ikhwān al-safā’ were an anonymous group of authors who resided in Basra (current day Iraq), influenced by Neoplatonic and Aristotelian thought and linked to the early Ismā‘īlī da‘wa (literally: to call; missionary preaching), which belongs to Shī‘ī Islam. The group’s attempt at maintaining anonymity does not come as a surprise given that the distinguishing aspect of Ismā‘īlism (branch from Shī‘ism) is a deep esotericism concerned with the inner dimensions of Islam.

This Ismā‘īlī esotericism fused with ancient Greek philosophy and produced the Ikhwan’s unique analysis of mathematics, epistemology, and metaphysical cosmology. The Ikhwān drew from Pythagorean thought to explain the Ismā‘īlī belief in a hierarchal world, Hellenistic metaphysical concepts of actuality and potentiality to describe how the human soul acquires knowledge, and they were inspired by Democritus’ worldview.

The present article provides an outline to assist readers in attaining a bird’s eye-view of this vast encyclopedia composed by brilliant Muslim scholars, who mastered all branches of knowledge in its manifold external and internal aspects.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. Short Description of the Work
  3. Philosophical Sciences
  4. Twofold in the Creation
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

One of the main obstacles preventing a proper understanding of the Isma'ili movement is the paucity of historical material exemplified by the fact that only Sunni sources relating Isma‘ili history survived. The early part of Isma‘ili history has two important phases. It is in this complex pre-Fatimid period that Jabir ibn Hayyan (d. C.E. 815) wrote many treatises on alchemy and on the mystical science of treatises. The Encyclopedia of the Ikhwan al-safa' was composed by authors who had a vast knowledge of Hellenic literature and the various contemporary sciences.

Isma'ilism developed a complex and rich theosophy which owed a great deal to Neoplatonism. In the 9TH century, Greek-to-Arabic translations proliferated, first by the intermediary of Syriac then directly. The version of Plotinus' Enneads possessed by Muslims was modified with changes and paraphrases; it was wrongly attributed to Aristotle and called Theologia of Aristotle, since Plotinus (Flutinus) remained mostly unknown to the Muslims by name. This latter work played a significant role in the development of Isma‘ilism

The Ikhwan al-Safa' remained an anonymous group of scholars, but when Abu Hayyan al-Tawhidi was asked about them, he identified some of them: Abu Sulayman al-Busti (known as al-Muqaddasi), 'Ali b. Harun al-Zanjani, Muhammad al-Nahrajuri (or al-Mihrajani), al-‘Awfi, and Zayd ibn Rifa‘i. The complete name of the group is Ikhwan al-Safa’ wa Khullan al-Wafa’ wa Ahl al-Hamd wa Abna’ al-Majd. The majority of scholars agree that the Ikhwan and their rasa'il belongs to the Isma‘ili movement. (cf. Nasr, 1978, p. 29; Marquet, 1971, p. 1071; Poonawala, p. 93)

2. Short Description of the Work

The Encyclopedia is divided into fifty-two epistles (rasa'il) of varying lengths, which make up four books. Each book develops different topics:

Book 1: the mathematical sciences (14 rasa'il) include theory of number, geometry, astronomy, geography, music, theoretical and practical arts, ethics and logic.

Book 2: the natural sciences (17 rasa'il) comprehend matter, form, motion, time, space, sky and universe, generation and corruption, meteorology, minerals, plants, animals, human body, perception, embryology, man as microcosm, development of souls in the body, limit of knowledge, death, pleasure, and language.

Book 3: the psychological and rational sciences (10 rasa'il) comprehend intellectual principles (Pythagoras and Ikhwan), universe as macrocosm, intelligence and intelligible, periods and era, passion, resurrection, species of movement, cause and effect, definitions and descriptions.

Book 4: the theological sciences (11 rasa'il) include doctrines and religions, way to God, doctrine of Ikhwan, essence of faith, divine law and prophethood, appeal to God, hierarchy, spiritual beings, politics, magic and talisman.

3. Philosophical Sciences

The incorporation of philosophical and theological doctrines in their writings were done teleogically. They were also influenced by neo-Pythagorean arithmetical theories, the authors based their theosophy on this Pythagorean principle: "the beings are according to the nature of the number." (Steigerwald, p. 82) They were inspired by the assertion attributed to Pythagoras: “In the knowledge of the properties of numbers and in the way they are classified and ranked in grades resides the knowledge of the beings of God.” (Steigerwald, p. 82) The Ikhwan al-safa' realized that each number depends on the one which precedes it. We can decompose the number unit by unit till we reach the first. But to the One “we can not withdraw anything […] because it is the origin and the source of number.”(Steigerwald, p. 82) According to them, beings are like numbers: they come from God and return finally to Him. This is a good example of how they adapted Pythagorean theories to their fundamental belief in a hierarchical world.

The metaphysics of the Ikhwan al-Safa' are built upon Hellenic philosophy. They share common terminology with the Aristotelian scheme, but the concepts (matter and form, substance --in Greek ousia -- and accidents, potentially and actuality, and the four causes) vary slightly. For them, learning is the reminiscence of knowledge already contained in the soul; the soul is 'potentially knowledgeable’ and becomes ‘actually knowledgeable’.

The Ikhwan hold that substance is self-existent and capable of receiving attributes. But form is divided into two kinds: substances and accidents. They conceive four causes: material, formal, efficient, and final. The material cause of plants is the four elements (fire, air, water, and earth) and their final cause is to provide food for animals. (rasa'il Ikhwan al-Safa', vol. 2 p. 79; cf. rasa'il Ikhwan al-Safa’, vol. 2 p. 115, vol. 3, p. 358) Here the Ikhwan ascribe for material cause the raw material (i.e. bronze or silver); for the formal cause, they give the example of an apple pip which is expected to produce an apple; the efficient cause indicates the origin, for example a father is the efficient cause of a child, and the final cause shows the purpose of something.

4. Twofold in the Creation

The process of creation is divided twofold: first, God creates ex nihilo the Intellect; immediately after the Intellect's emanation (fayd), it proceeds gradually, giving shape to the present universe. The order and character of emanation are described below. (rasa'il Ikhwan al-Safa’, vol. 1 p. 54; cf. rasa'il Ikhwan al-Safa’, vol. 3 pp. 184, 196-7; 235)

(1) Al-Bari' (Creator, or God) is the First and only Eternal Being, no anthropomorphic attribute is to be ascribed to Him. Only the will to originate pertains to Him. The Ikhwan present an Unknowable God (Deus Absconditus) at the top of the hierarchy while the Qur’anic God (Deus Revelatus), another facet of God, guides people on the right path.

(2) Al-'Aql (Intellect or Gr. Noûs) is the first being to originate from God. It is one in number as God Himself is One. God created all the forms of subsequent beings in the Intellect, from which emanated the Universal soul and the first matter. It is clear, in the opinion of the Ikhwan, that the Intellect, a counterpart of God, is the best representative of God.

(3) Al-Nafs al-Kulliyya (The Universal Soul) is the Soul of the whole universe, a simple essence which emanates from the Intellect. It receives its energy from the Intellect. It manifests itself in the sun through which is animated the whole sublunary (material) world. What we call creation, in our physical world, pertains to the Universal Soul.

(4) Al-Hayula al-Ula (Prime Matter, arabicized from Gr. hyle), is a spiritual substance that is unable to emanate by itself. It is caused by the Intellect to proceed from the Universal Soul which helps it to emanate and accept different forms.

(5) Al-Tabi'at (Nature) is the energy diffused throughout all organic and inorganic bodies. It is the cause of motion, life, and change. The influence of intellect ceases at this stage of Nature. All subsequent emanations tend to be more and more material and defective.

(6) Al-Jism al-Mutlaq (The Absolute Body) comes about when First matter acquires physical properties, and it is the physical substance of which our world is made.

(7) The World of the Spheres (of the fixed stars, Saturn, Jupiter, Mars, the Sun, Venus, Mercury, and the Moon) appears in the seventh stage of emanation. All the heavenly bodies are made up of a fifth element (ether), and are not subject to generation and corruption.

(8) The Four Elements (fire, air, water, and earth) come immediately under the sphere of the moon where they are subjected to generation and corruption. The Ikhwan adopted the view of Thales (d. c. B.C.E. 545) and the Ionians that the four "elements" change into one another, water becomes air and fire; fire becomes air, water, earth, etc.

(9) The Three Kingdoms are the last stage of emanation. The three kingdoms (mineral, plant, and animal) are made of proportional intermixture of the four elements.

The Ikhwan al-Safa' took over the theory of Democritus of Abdera (d. c. B.C.E. 370) which considered man as a reduced model of the universe (microcosm), and the universe as an enlarged copy of man (macrocosm). They regard the human being as a miniature world. (Netton, pp. 14-15) The individual souls (al-nafs al-juz’iyya), representing the infinite powers of the Universal Soul, began to form. During a very long time, these souls filled the world of spheres and constituted the angels, who animated heavenly bodies. In the early stage, the angels contemplated the Intellect and performed the worship due to God. After a lapse of time, some of these individual souls began to forget much about their origin and office. Their inattention caused the fall of the souls into the physical earth. This explains the metaphysical origin of life on earth.

5. References and Further Reading

  • De Callataÿ, Godefroid. "The Classification of the Sciences according to the rasa'il Ikhwan al-Safa'."
  • Corbin, Henry. History of Islamic Philosophy. Translated from French by Liadian Sherrad and Philipp Sherrad. London: Kegan Paul International, 1993: 133-136.
  • Fakhry, Majid. A history of Islamic Philosophy. Second Edition. New York: Columbia University Press, 1983.
  • Farrukh, Omar A. "Ikhwan al-Safa'." In A History of Muslim Philosophy. Edited and Introduced by M.M. Sharif. Wiesabaden: Otta Harrassowitz, (1963): 289-310.
  • Hamdani, Abbas. "Abu Hayyan al-Tawhidi and the Brethren of Purity." International Journal of Middle East Studies, Vol. 9 (1978): 345-353.
  • Ikhwan al-Safa'. Rasa'il Ikhwan al-Safa’ (Epistles of the Brethren of Purity). Beirut: Dar Sadir, 4 vols., 1957 (The complete text of the fifty-two epistles in the original edited by Arabic Butrus Bustani).
  • Ikhwan al-Safa'. Al-Risala al-Jami'a. Edited by J. Saliba. Damascus, vol. 1, 1387/1949, vol. 2 n:d.
  • Maquet, Yves. "Ikhwan al-Safa'." Encyclopaedia of Islam. Vol. 3 (1971): 1071-1076.
  • Marquet, Yves. La philosophie des Ihwan al-Safa'. Algers: Société Nationale d’Édition et de Diffusion, 1975.
  • Marquet, Yves. "Les Épîtres des Ikhwan as-Safa', œuvre ismaïlienne." Studia Islamica. Vol. 61 (1985): 57-79.
  • Marquet, Yves. "Ihwan as-Safa', Ismaïliens et Qarmates." Arabica. Vol. 24 (1977): 233-257.
  • Marquet, Yves. "Les Ihwan as-Safa' et l’ismaïlisme." In Convegne sugli Ikhwan as-Safa’. Rome, 1971.
  • Marquet, Yves. La Philosophie des alchimistes et l'alchimie des philosophes: Jabir ibn Hayyan et les Ihwan al-Safa’. Paris: Maisonneuve et Larose, 1988.
  • Poonawala, Ismail K. "Ikhwan al-safa'." Vol. 7. The Encyclopedia of Religion. (1987): 92-95.
  • Nasr, Seyyed Hossein. Islamic Cosmological Doctrines. London: Thames Hudson, 1978: 23-96.
  • Nasr, Seyyed Hossein and Mehdi Aminrazavi (ed.). An Anthology of Philosophy in Persia. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001: 201-279.
  • Netton, I.R. Muslim Neoplatonists: An Introduction to the Thought of the Brethren of Purity (Ikhwan al-Safa'). London: Allen & Unwin; 1982.
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Author Information

Diana Steigerwald
California State University - Long Beach
U. S. A.

Ibn Rushd (Averroes) (1126—1198)

ibn RushdAbu al-Walid Muhammad ibn Ahmad ibn Rushd, better known in the Latin West as Averroes, lived during a unique period in Western intellectual history, in which interest in philosophy and theology was waning in the Muslim world and just beginning to flourish in Latin Christendom. Just fifteen years before his birth, the great critic of Islamic philosophy, al-Ghazzali (1058-1111), had died after striking a blow against Muslim Neoplatonic philosophy, particularly against the work of the philosopher Ibn Sina (Avicenna). From such bleak circumstances emerged the Spanish-Muslim philosophers, of which the jurist and physician Ibn Rushd came to be regarded as the final and most influential Muslim philosopher, especially to those who inherited the tradition of Muslim philosophy in the West.

His influential commentaries and unique interpretations on Aristotle revived Western scholarly interest in ancient Greek philosophy, whose works for the most part had been neglected since the sixth century. He critically examined the alleged tension between philosophy and religion in the Decisive Treatise, and he challenged the anti-philosophical sentiments within the Sunni tradition sparked by al-Ghazzali. This critique ignited a similar re-examination within the Christian tradition, influencing a line of scholars who would come to be identified as the “Averroists.”

Ibn Rushd contended that the claim of many Muslim theologians that philosophers were outside the fold of Islam had no base in scripture. His novel exegesis of seminal Quranic verses made the case for three valid “paths” of arriving at religious truths, and that philosophy was one if not the best of them, therefore its study should not be prohibited. He also challenged Asharite, Mutazilite, Sufi, and “literalist” conceptions of God’s attributes and actions, noting the philosophical issues that arise out of their notions of occasionalism, divine speech, and explanations of the origin of the world. Ibn Rushd strived to demonstrate that without engaging religion critically and philosophically, deeper meanings of the tradition can be lost, ultimately leading to deviant and incorrect understandings of the divine.

This article provides an overview of Ibn Rushd’s contributions to philosophy, emphasizing his commentaries, his original works in Islamic philosophy, and his lasting influence on medieval thought and the Western philosophical tradition.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Note on Commentaries
  3. Philosophy and Religion
  4. Existence and Attributes of God
  5. Origin of the World
  6. Metaphysics
  7. Psychology
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading a. Primary Sources
    b. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Ibn Rushd was born in Cordova, Spain, to a family with a long and well-respected tradition of legal and public service. His grandfather, the influential Abdul-Walid Muhammad (d. 1126), was the chief judge of Cordova, under the Almoravid dynasty, establishing himself as a specialist in legal methodology and in the teachings of the various legal schools. Ibn Rushd's father, Abdul-Qasim Ahmad, although not as venerated as his grandfather, held the same position until the Almoravids were ousted by the Almohad dynasty in 1146.

Ibn Rushd's education followed a traditional path, beginning with studies in hadith, linguistics, jurisprudence and scholastic theology. The earliest biographers and Muslim chroniclers speak little about his education in science and philosophy, where most interest from Western scholarship in him lies, but note his propensity towards the law and his life as a jurist. It is generally believed that Ibn Rushd was influenced by the philosophy of Ibn Bajjah (Avempace), and perhaps was once tutored by him. His medical education was directed under Abu Jafar ibn Harun of Trujillo. His aptitude for medicine was noted by his contemporaries and can be seen in his major enduring work Kitab al-Kulyat fi al-Tibb (Generalities) This book, together with Kitab al-Taisir fi al-Mudawat wa al-Tadbir (Particularities) written by Abu Marwan Ibn Zuhr, became the main medical textbooks for physicians in the Jewish, Christian and Muslim worlds for centuries to come.

Ibn Rushd traveled to Marrakesh and came under the patronage of the caliph 'Abd al-Mu'min, likely involved in educational reform for the dynasty. The Almohads, like the Almoravids they had supplanted, were a Northwest African Kharijite-influenced Berber reform movement. Founded in the theology of Ibn Tumart (1078-1139), who emphasized divine unity and the idea of divine promise and threat, he believed that a positive system of law could co-exist with a rational and practical theology. This led to the concept that law needed to be primarily based on revelation instead of the traditions of the jurists. Ibn Talmart's theology affirmed that the existence and essence of God could be established through reason alone, and used that to posit an ethical legal theory that depended on a divine transcendence.

Ibn Rushd's relationship with the Almohad was not merely opportunistic, (considering the support his father and grandfather had given to the Almoravids) for it influenced his work significantly; notably his ability to unite philosophy and religion. Sometime between 1159 and 1169, during one of his periods of residence in Marrakesh, Ibn Rushd befriended Ibn Tufayl (Abubacer), a philosopher who was the official physician and counselor to Caliph Abu Yaqub Yusuf, son of 'Abd al-Mu'min. It was Ibn Tufayl who introduced Ibn Rushd to the ruler. The prince was impressed by the young philosopher and employed him first as chief judge and later as chief physician. Ibn Rushd’s legacy as the commentator of Aristotle was also due to Abu Yaqub Yusuf. Although well-versed in ancient philosophy, the prince complained about the challenge posed by the Greek philosopher’s texts and commissioned Ibn Rushd to write a series of commentaries on them.

Through most of Ibn Rushd's service, the Almohads grew more liberal, leading eventually to their formal rejection of Ibn Talmart’s theology and adoption of Malikite law in 1229. Despite this tendency, public pressure against perceived liberalizing tendencies in the government led to the formal rejection of Ibn Rushd and his writings in 1195. He was exiled to Lucena, a largely Jewish village outside of Cordoba, his writings were banned and his books burned. This period of disgrace did not last long, however, and Ibn Rushd returned to Cordoba two years later, but died the following year. Doubts about Ibn Rushd’s orthodoxy persisted, but as Islamic interest in his philosophy waned, his writings found new audiences in the Christian and Jewish worlds.

2. Note on Commentaries

While this article focuses on Ibn Rushd's own philosophical writings, a word about the significant number of commentaries he wrote is important. Ibn Rushd wrote on many subjects, including law and medicine. In law he outshone all his predecessors, writing on legal methodology, legal pronouncements, sacrifices and land taxes. He discussed topics as diverse as cleanliness, marriage, jihad and the government’s role with non-Muslims. As for medicine, in addition to his medical encyclopedia mentioned above, Ibn Rushd wrote a commentary on Avicenna’s medical work and a number of summaries on the works of Galen. Besides his own philosophical and theological work, Ibn Rushd wrote extensive commentaries on the texts of a wide range of thinkers. These commentaries provide interesting insights into how Ibn Rushd arrived at certain positions and how much he was authentically Aristotelian. Commissioned to explain Aristotle Ibn Rushd spent three decades producing multiple commentaries on all of Aristotle’s works, save his Politics, covering every subject from aesthetics and ethics to logic and zoology. He also wrote about Plato’s Republic, Alexander’s De Intellectu, the Metaphysics of Nicolaus of Damascus, the Isagoge of Porphyry, and the Almajest of Ptolemy. Ibn Rushd would often write more than one commentary on Aristotle’s texts; for many he wrote a short or paraphrase version, a middle version and a long version. Each expanded his examination of the originals and their interpretations by other commentators, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias, Themistius and Ibn Bajjah, The various versions were meant for readers with different levels of understanding.

Ibn Rushd's desire was to shed the prevalent Neoplatonic interpretations of Aristotle, and get back to what the Greek thinker originally had intended to communicate. Of course, Ibn Rushd did not shy away from inserting his own thoughts into his commentaries, and his short paraphrase commentaries were often flexible interpretations. At times, in an effort to explain complex ideas in Aristotle, Ibn Rushd would rationalize the philosopher in directions that would not seem authentic to contemporary interpreters of Aristotle. Nevertheless, Ibn Rushd’s commentaries came to renew Western intellectual interest in Aristotle, whose works had been largely ignored or lost since the sixth century.

3. Philosophy and Religion

Until the eighth century, and the rise of the Mutazilite theology, Greek philosophy was viewed with suspicion. Despite the political support given to philosophy because of the Mutazilites and the early philosophers, a strong anti-philosophical movement rose through theological schools like the Hanbalites and the Asharites. These groups, particular the latter, gained public and political influence throughout the tenth and eleventh century Islamic world. These appealed to more conservative elements within society, to those who disliked what appeared to be non-Muslim influences. Ibn Rushd, who served a political dynasty that had come into power under a banner of orthodox reform while privately encouraging the study of philosophy, was likely sensitive to the increasing tensions that eventually led to his banishment. Though written before his exile his Decisive Treatise provides an apologetic for those theologians who charged philosophers with unbelief.

Ibn Rushd begins with the contention that Law commands the study of philosophy. Many Quranic verses, such as "Reflect, you have a vision" (59.2) and “they give thought to the creation of heaven and earth” (3:191), command human intellectual reflection upon God and his creation. This is best done by demonstration, drawing inferences from accepted premises, which is what both lawyers and philosophers do. Since, therefore, such obligation exists in religion, then a person who has the capacity of “natural intelligence” and “religious integrity” must begin to study philosophy. If someone else has examined these subjects in the past, the believer should build upon their work, even if they did not share the same religion. For, just as in any subject of study, the creation of knowledge is built successively from one scholar to the next. This does not mean that the ancients' teachings should be accepted uncritically, but if what is found within their teachings is true, then it should not be rejected because of religion. (Ibn Rushd illustrated this point by citing that when a sacrifice is performed with the prescribed instrument, it does not matter if the owner of the instrument shares the same religion as the one performing the sacrifice.)

The philosopher, when following the proper order of education, should not be harmed by his studies, hence it is wrong to forbid the study of philosophy. Any harm that may occur is accidental, like that of the side effects of medicine, or from choking on water when thirsty. If serious harm comes from philosophical study, Ibn Rushd suggests that this is because the student was dominated by their passions, had a bad teacher or suffered some natural deficiency. Ibn Rushd illustrates this by quoting a saying of the Prophet Muhammad, when asked by a man about his brother's diarrhea. The Prophet suggested that the brother should drink honey. When the man returned to say that his brother’s diarrhea had worsened, the Prophet replied, "Allah has said the truth, but your brother's abdomen has told a lie" (Bukhari 7.71.588).

Not all people are able to find truth through philosophy, which is why the Law speaks of three ways for humans to discover truth and interpret scripture: the demonstrative, the dialectical and the rhetorical. These, for Ibn Rushd, divide humanity into philosophers, theologians and the common masses. The simple truth is that Islam is the best of all religions, in that, consistent with the goal of Aristotelian ethics, it produces the most happiness, which is comprised of the knowledge of God. As such, one way is appointed to every person, consistent with their natural disposition, so that they can acquire this truth.

For Ibn Rushd, demonstrative truth cannot conflict with scripture (i.e. Qur'an), since Islam is ultimate truth and the nature of philosophy is the search for truth. If scripture does conflict with demonstrative truth, such conflict must be only apparent. If philosophy and scripture disagree on the existence of any particular being, scripture should be interpreted allegorically. Ibn Rushd contends that allegorical interpretation of scripture is common among the lawyers, theologians and the philosophers, and has been long accepted by all Muslims; Muslims only disagree on the extent and propriety of its use. God has given various meanings and interpretations, both apparent and hidden, to numerous scriptures so as to inspire study and to suit diverse intelligences. The early Muslim community, according to Ibn Rushd, affirmed that scripture had both an apparent meaning and an inner meaning. If the Muslim community has come to a consensus regarding the meaning of any particular passage, whether allegorical or apparent, no one can contradict that interpretation. If there is no consensus about a particular passage, then its meaning is free for interpretation. The problem is that, with the international diversity and long history of Islam, it is all but impossible to establish a consensus on most verses. For no one can be sure to have gathered all the opinions of all scholars from all times. With this in mind, according to Ibn Rushd, scholars like al-Ghazzali should not charge philosophers with unbelief over their doctrines of the eternity of the universe, the denial of God's knowledge of particulars, or denial of bodily resurrection. Since the early Muslims accepted the existence of apparent and allegorical meanings of texts, and since there is no consensus on these doctrines, such a charge can only be tentative. Philosophers have been divinely endowed with unique methods of learning, acquiring their beliefs through demonstrative arguments and securing them with allegorical interpretation.

Therefore, the theologians and philosophers are not so greatly different, that either should label the other as irreligious. And, like the philosophers, the theologians interpret certain texts allegorically, and such interpretations should not be infallible. For instance, he contends that even the apparent meaning of scripture fails to support the theologian's doctrine of creation ex nihilo. He highlights texts like 11:7, 41:11 and 65:48, which imply that objects such as a throne, water and smoke pre-existed the formation of the world and that something will exist after the End of Days.

A teacher, then, must communicate the interpretation of scripture proper for his respective audiences. To the masses, Ibn Rushd cautions, a teacher must teach the apparent meaning of all texts. Higher categories of interpretations should only be taught to those who are qualified through education. To teach the masses a dialectical or demonstrative interpretation, as Ibn Rushd contends Ghazzali did in his Incoherence, is to hurt the faith of the believers. The same applies to teaching a theologian philosophical interpretations.

4. Existence and Attributes of God

Ibn Rushd, shortly after writing his Decisive Treatise, wrote a treatise on the doctrine of God known as Al-Kashf 'an Manahij al-Adilla fi ‘Aqaid al-Milla (the Exposition of the Methods of Proof Concerning the Beliefs of the Community). His goal was to examine the religious doctrines that are held by the public and determine if any of the many doctrines expounded by the different sects were the intention of the "lawgiver." In particular he identifies four key sects as the targets of his polemic, the Asharites, Mutazilites, the Sufis and the “literalists,” claiming that they all have distorted the scriptures and developed innovative doctrines not compatible with Islam. Ibn Rushd's polemic, then, becomes a clear expression of his doctrine on God. He begins with examining the arguments for the existence of God given by the different sects, dismissing each one as erroneous and harmful to the public. Ibn Rushd contends that there are only two arguments worthy of adherence, both of which are found in the "Precious Book;" for example, surahs 25:61, 78:6-16 and 80:24-33. The first is the argument of “providence,” in which one can observe that everything in the universe serves the purpose of humanity. Ibn Rushd speaks of the sun, the moon, the earth and the weather as examples of how the universe is conditioned for humans. If the universe is, then, so finely-tuned, then it bespeaks of a fine tuner - God. The second is the argument of “invention,” stemming from the observation that everything in the world appears to have been invented. Plants and animals have a construction that appears to have been designed; as such a designer must have been involved, and that is God.

From establishing the existence of God, Ibn Rushd turns to explaining the nature and attributes of God. Beginning with the doctrine of divine unity, Ibn Rushd challenges the Asharite argument that there cannot, by definition, be two gods for any disagreement between them would entail that one or both cannot be God. This, of course, means that, in the case of two gods, at least one's will would be thwarted in some fashion at some time by the other; and such an event would mean that they are not omnipotent, which is a essential trait of deity. Ibn Rushd’s critique turns the apologetic on its head, contending that if there were two gods, there is an equal possibility of both gods working together, which would mean that both of their wills were fulfilled. Furthermore, Ibn Rushd adds, even disagreement would not thwart divine will, for alternatives could occur giving each god its desire. Such arguments lead to absurdity and are not fit for the masses. The simple fact is that reason affirms divine unity, which, by definition, is a confession of God’s existence and the denial of any other deity.

Ibn Rushd maintains, as did most of his theologian contemporaries that there are seven divine attributes, analogous to the human attributes. These attributes are: knowledge, life, power, will, hearing, vision and speech. For the philosopher, the attribute of knowledge occupied much space in his writing on the attributes of God. He contends, especially in his Epistle Dedicatory and his Decisive Treatise that divine knowledge is analogous to human knowledge only in name, human knowledge is the product of effect and divine knowledge is a product of cause. God, being the cause of the universe, has knowledge based on being its cause; while humans have knowledge based on the effects of such causes.

The implication of this distinction is important, since Ibn Rushd believes that philosophers who deny God's knowledge of particulars are in error. God knows particulars because he is the cause of such things. But this raises an important question: does God’s knowledge change with knowledge of particulars? That is, when events or existents move from non-existence to existence, does God’s knowledge change with this motion? Change in divine knowledge would imply divine change, and for medieval thinkers it was absurd to think that God was not immutable.

Ghazzali answered this dilemma by saying that God's knowledge does not change, only his relationship with the object. Just like a person sitting with a glass of water on their left side does not fundamentally change when that same glass is moved to their right side. Ibn Rushd felt that Ghazzali’s answer did not solve the dilemma, stating that a change in relationship is still change. For Ibn Rushd, then, the solution came in his contention that divine knowledge is rooted in God being the eternal Prime Mover—meaning that God eternally knows every action that will be caused by him. God, therefore, does not know that event when it occurs, as humans would, because he has always known it.

As for the other traits, Ibn Rushd next turns to the attribute of life, simply stating that life necessarily flows from the attribute of knowledge, as evidenced in the world around us. Divine will and power are defined as essential characteristics of God, characteristics that define God as God. This is because the existence of any created being implies the existence of an agent that willed its existence and had the power to do so. (The implication of this, Ibn Rushd notes, is that the Asharite concept that God had eternally willed the existence of the world, but created it at some particular point in time, is illogical.)

In regards to divine speech, Ibn Rushd is aware of the great theological debate in Islam about whether the Qur'an, the embodiment of God’s speech, is temporally created or eternal. Ibn Rushd contends that the attribute of divine speech is affirmed because it necessarily flows from the attributes of knowledge and power, and speech is nothing more than these. Divine speech, Ibn Rushd notes, is expressed through intermediaries, whether the work of the angels or the revelations given to the prophets. As such, "the Qur’an…is eternal but the words denoting it are created by God Almighty, not by men." The Qur’an, therefore, differs from words found elsewhere, in that the words of the Qur’an are directly created by God, while human words are our own work given by God’s permission.

Ibn Rushd concludes by discussing divine hearing and vision, and notes that scripture relates these attributes to God in the sense that he perceives things in existing things that are not apprehended by the intellect. An artisan would know everything in an artifact he had created, and two means of this knowledge would be sight and sound. God, being God, would apprehend all things in creation through all modes of apprehension, and as such would have vision and hearing.

5. Origin of the World

Turning from the attributes of God to the actions of God, where he delineates his view of creation, Ibn Rushd in his Tahafut al-Tahafut clearly deals with the charge against the philosopher's doctrine on the eternity of the physical universe in his polemic against al-Ghazzali. Ghazzali perceived that the philosophers had misunderstood the relationship between God and the world, especially since the Qur’an is clear on divine creation. Ghazzali, sustaining the Asharite emphasis on divine power, questioned why God, being the ultimate agent, could not simply create the world ex nihilo and then destroy it in some future point in time? Why did there need to be some obstacle to explain a delay in God’s creative action? In response to this, Ghazzali offered a number of lengthy proofs to challenge the philosopher’s assertions.

Ibn Rushd, who often labeled Ghazzali's arguments dialectical, sophistical or feeble, merely replied that the eternal works differently than the temporal. As humans, we can willfully decide to perform some action and then wait a period of time before completing it. For God, on the other hand, there can be no gap between decision and action; for what differentiates one time from another in God’s mind? Also, what physical limits can restrict God from acting? Ibn Rushd, in the first discussion, writes about how Ghazzali confused the definition of eternal and human will, making them univocal. For humans, the will is the faculty to choose between two options, and it is desire that compels the will to choose. For God, however, this definition of will is meaningless. God cannot have desire because that would entail change within the eternal when the object of desire was fulfilled. Furthermore, the creation of the world is not simply the choice between two equal alternatives, but a choice of existence or non-existence. Finally, if all the conditions for action were fulfilled, there would not be any reason for God not to act. God, therefore, being omniscient and omnipotent would have known from the eternal past what he had planned to create, and without limit to his power, there would no condition to stop the creation from occurring.

Ghazzali's argument follows the typical Asharite kalam cosmological argument, in that he argues the scientific evidence for the temporal origin of the world, and reasons from that to the existence of a creator. Ghazzali’s first proof contends that the idea of the infinite number of planetary revolutions as an assumption of the eternity of the world is erroneous since one can determine their revolution rates and how much they differ when compared one to another. Ibn Rushd weakly maintains that the concept of numbered planetary revolutions and their division does not apply to eternal beings. To say that the eternal can be divided is absurd since there can be no degrees to the infinite. Oliver Leaman explains how Ibn Rushd accepted accidental but not essential infinite series of existents. There can be an infinite chain of human sexual generation, but those beings that are essentially infinite have neither beginning nor end and thus cannot be divided.

In his Decisive Treatise Ibn Rushd summarily reduces the argument between the Asharite theologians and the ancient philosophers to one of semantics. Both groups agree that there are three classes of being, two extremes and one intermediate being. They agree about the name of the extremes, but disagree about the intermediate class. One extreme is those beings that are brought into existence by something (matter), from something other than itself (efficient cause) and originate in time. The second, and opposite, class is that which is composed of nothing, caused by nothing and whose existence is eternal; this class of being is demonstratively known as God. The third class, is that which is comprised of anything or is not preceded by time, but is brought into existence by an agent; this is what is known as the world. Theologians affirm that time did not exist before the existence of the world, since time is related to the motion of physical bodies. They also affirm that the world exists infinitely into the future. As such, since the philosophers accept these two contentions, the two groups only disagree on the existence of the world in the eternal past.

Since the third class relates to both the first and second classes, the dispute between the philosophers and the theologians is merely how close the third class is to one of the other two classes. If closer to the first class, it would resemble originated beings; if closer to the second class, it would resemble more the eternal being. For Ibn Rushd, the world can neither be labeled pre-eternal nor originated, since the former would imply that the world is uncaused and the latter would imply that the world is perishable.

Ibn Rushd finds pre-existing material forms in Quranic texts such as 11:9, where he maintains that one finds a throne and water pre-existing the current forms of the universe; he contends that the theologians' interpretation of such passages are arbitrary. This is because nowhere in the Qur’an is the idea of God existing as pure being before the creation of the world to be found.

The debate for Ibn Rushd and Ghazzali centers, ultimately, upon the idea of causation. Ghazzali, the dedicated Asharite, wants to support the position that God is the ultimate cause of all actions; that no being in the universe is the autonomous cause of anything. For instance, a spark put on a piece of wood does not cause fire; rather God causes the fire and has allowed the occasion of spark and wood to be the method by which he creates fire. God, if he so desired, could simply will fire not to occur when a spark and wood meet. For Ghazzali, this is the explanation of the occurrence of miracles: divine creative actions that suspend laws habitually accepted by humans. Ghazzali, in his Tahafut, speaks of the decapitated man continuing to live because God willed it so.

Ibn Rushd, the consummate Aristotelian, maintains in his Tahafut Aristotle's contention that a full explanation of any event or existence needs to involve a discussion of the material, formal, efficient and final cause. Ibn Rushd, then, insists that Ghazzali’s view would be counter-productive to scientific knowledge and contrary to common-sense. The universe, according to the human mind, works along certain causal principles and the beings existing within the universe contain particular natures that define their existence; if these natures, principles and characteristics were not definitive, then this would lead to nihilism (i.e. the atheistic materialists found in the Greek and Arab worlds). As for the idea of cause and effect being a product of habitual observation, Ibn Rushd asks if such observations are a product of God's habit or our own observations. It cannot, he asserts, be the former, since the Qur’an speaks of God’s actions as unalterable. If the latter, the idea of habit applies only to animate beings, for the habitual actions of inanimate objects are tantamount to physical laws of motion.

6. Metaphysics

Metaphysics, for Ibn Rushd, does not simply deal with God or theology; rather it concerns itself with different classes of being and the analogical idea of being. It is, thus, a science that distinguishes inferior classes of being from real being. Ibn Rushd, the adamant Aristotelian, puts his own slant on Aristotle's metaphysics. Ibn Rushd’s classification of being begins with accidental substances, which are physical beings, then moves to being of the soul / mind and finally discusses whether the substance existing outside the soul, such as the sphere of the fixed stars, is material or immaterial. This hierarchy, notes Charles Genequand, differs from Aristotle's hierarchy of material beings, beings of the soul / mind and unchangeable entities. The first and third categories of both thinkers are somewhat similar in that they encompass a straight demarcation between material and immaterial being. Ibn Rushd’s second class of being, however, includes both universals and mathematical beings; and as such cannot be the bridge between physics and metaphysics as it is in Aristotle. Rather, he contended that all autonomous beings, whether material or not, constitute a single category. This was likely a response to the more materialistic interpretations of Aristotle, such as that of Alexander of Aphrodisias, for Ibn Rushd did not see physics and the metaphysical at opposite sides of the spectrum.

Substance, not beings of the mind, was the common link between physics and metaphysics for Ibn Rushd. Substance, therefore, has an ontological, though not necessarily temporal, priority over other parts of being. Since, then, metaphysics covers both sensible and eternal substances, its subject matter overlaps with that of physics. In the cosmos, then, there are two classes of eternal things, the essentially eternal and the numerically eternal. This division represents the separation between the celestial realm and the physical universe, where the living beings in the latter are bound to an eternal cycle of generation and corruption, while the former are immortal animals. Ibn Rushd does not contend that celestial bodies cause the world, rather the motion of these bodies are the "principle" of what occurs on earth.

This point is more fully developed in Ibn Rushd's discussion regarding spontaneous generation: the idea that certain beings are created by external agents without being subject to the cycle of generation and corruption. This was a common subject of debate throughout later Greek and medieval philosophy. If beings like insects spontaneously generated from rotting food are externally generated, therein lies proof for a created universe and Asharite occasionalism, neither of which Ibn Rushd maintains. His solution is the Aristotelian doctrine of emanation, which states that no being is created but merely is the principle that unites matter and form. Since Ibn Rushd asserts that physical generation is the product of both seed, which contains forms in potentiality, and solar heat, the sun being a heavenly being; spontaneous generation, in which the seed is absent, is merely the effect of solar heat upon the basic elements (i.e. earth and water).

In the cosmological sphere, according to physics, one finds things that are both moving and moved at once and things that are only moved. Therefore, there must be something that imparts motion but is never moved; this is the Prime Mover (i.e. God). Physics, thus, provides the proof for the existence of a Prime Mover, and metaphysics is concerned with the action of this mover. The Prime Mover is the ultimate agent for Ibn Rushd and it must be eternal and pure actuality. It did not merely push the universe into existence and remain idle thereafter, for the universe would slip into chaos. Ibn Rushd acknowledges that the idea of actuality being essentially prior to potentiality counters common sense, but to accept the opposite would entail the possibility of spontaneous movement or negation of movement within the universe.

How, then, is the Prime Mover the principle of motion and causation in the cosmos without being moved itself? Ibn Rushd contends that the Prime Mover moves the cosmos, particularly the celestial bodies, by being the object of desire. Celestial beings have souls, which possess the higher power of intellect and desire, and these beings desire the perfection of God, thereby they move accordingly. Desire in the celestial beings, according to Ibn Rushd, is not the real faculty it is in humans. Since these beings have no sense perception, desire is united with intellect causing a desire for what rationally is perfection - the Prime Mover.

Ibn Rushd rejects the Arab Neoplatonic doctrine of emanation because it simply implies a temporal succession of one being producing another, which is impossible for eternal beings. By this rejection, however, Ibn Rushd recognizes a problem within his system. If God is intellectually present within the celestial bodies, there is no need for them to move in an effort to acquire this perfection. Ibn Rushd responds with an analogy of a cabinet-maker, who has the idea of a cabinet existing in his mind, but his body needs to move in order to imprint this idea upon matter. Celestial beings move in likewise matter, in order to obtain perfection, which produces the physical universe. Furthermore, this effort to obtain perfection in the celestial bodies, which is in imitation of God, effects the order of the universe.

With the Prime Mover, the celestial bodies and the physical world, Ibn Rushd has a three level cosmological view. He illustrates his cosmological order by using the analogy of the state, where everyone obeys and imitates the king. All smaller social units in the kingdom, like the family, are subordinate to the head, which is ultimately under the authority of the king. There is a hierarchy among the spheres of celestial beings, based on their "nobility" (sharaf) and not, as Avicenna held, on their order in emanation. Of course, the order of nobility parallels emanation's order, for the hierarchical order is that which we see in the universe, the fixed stars, the planets, the moon and the earth. Like a king, the Prime Mover imparts motion only to the First Body (the sphere of the fixed stars), which becomes the intermediary for the other bodies. This leads to the other spheres (i.e. planets) to desire both the Prime Mover and the First Body, which, according to Ibn Rushd, explains how the celestial bodies move from east to west at one time and from west to east at another time. It is the desire of one that moves the planets in one way, and the desire of the other that moves them in the opposite direction.

Ultimately, as H. Davidson notes, Ibn Rushd has a cosmos in which the earth is its physical center. Surrounding the earth, at different levels, are the celestial spheres, which contain celestial bodies (e.g. the sun, moon, stars and planets), which all revolve around the earth. The motion of these spheres is attributed to immortal intelligences, governed by a primary immutable and impersonal cause. Each sphere exists in its own right, though somehow the intelligence is caused by the Prime Mover, and it is through their contemplation of the Prime Mover they receive perfection equivalent to the position they hold in the cosmological hierarchy. As such, God no longer is restricted to being a cause of one thing. The active intellect is the last sphere in the hierarchy, but is not the product of another, and like the other intelligences its cognition is fixed on God. This idea has significant influence on Ibn Rushd's doctrine of the human soul and intellect.

7. Psychology

Like Aristotle, Ibn Rushd views the study of the psyche as a part of physics, since it is related specifically to the generable and corruptible union of form and matter found in the physical world and passed from generation to generation through the seed and natural heat. Ibn Rushd's views on psychology are most fully discussed in his Talkbis Kitab al-Nafs (Aristotle on the Soul). Here Ibn Rushd, as M. Fakhry comments, divided the soul into five faculties: the nutritive, the sensitive, the imaginative, the appetitive and the rational. The primary psychological faculty of all plants and animals is the nutritive or vegetative faculty, passed on through sexual generation, as noted above. The remaining four higher faculties are dependent on the nutritive faculty and are really perfections of this faculty, the product of a nature urging to move higher and higher.

The nutritive faculty uses natural heat to convert nutrients from potentiality to actuality, which are essential for basic survival, growth and reproduction of the living organism. , This faculty is an active power which is moved by the heavenly body (Active Intellect). Meanwhile, the sensitive faculty is a passive power divided into two aspects, the proximate and the ultimate, in which the former is moved within the embryo by the heavenly body and the latter is moved by sensible objects. The sensitive faculty in finite, in that it is passive, mutable, related to sensible forms and dependent upon the animal's physical senses (e.g. touch or vision). A part of these senses, notes Fakhry, is the sensus communis, a sort of sixth sense that perceives common sensibles (i.e. objects that require more than one sense to observe), discriminates among these sensibles, and comprehends that it perceives. Benmakhlouf notes that the imaginative faculty is dependent on the sensitive faculty, in that its forms result from the sensible forms, which Fakhry contends are stored in sensus communis. It differs from the sensitive faculty, however, by the fact that it "apprehends objects which are no longer present…its apprehensions are often false or fictitious," and it can unite individual images of objects perceived separately. Imagination is not opinion or reasoning, since it can conceive of unfalsified things and its objects are particular not universal, and may be finite because it is mutable (moving from potentiality to actuality by the forms stored in the sensus communis). The imaginative faculty stimulates the appetitive faculty, which is understood as desire, since it imagines desirable objects. Fakhry adds that the imaginative and appetitive faculties are essentially related, in that it is the former that moves the latter to desire or reject any pleasurable or repulsive object.

The rational faculty, seen as the capstone of Ibn Rushd's psychology by Fakhry, is unlike the imaginative faculty, in that it apprehends motion in a universal way and separate from matter. It has two divisions, the practical and theoretical, given to humans alone for their ultimate moral and intellectual perfection. The rational faculty is the power that allows humanity to create, understand and be ethical. The practical is derived from the sensual and imaginative faculties, in that it is rooted in sensibles and related to moral virtues like friendship and love. The theoretical apprehends universal intelligibles and does not need an external agent for intellectualization, contrary to the doctrine of the Active Intellect in Neoplatonism.

In its effort to achieve perfection, the rational faculty moves from potentiality to actuality. In doing so it goes through a number of stages, know as the process of intellectation. Ibn Rushd had discerned, as seen in his Long Commentary on De Anima, five distinct meanings of the Aristotelian intellect. They were, first and foremost, the material (potential) and the active (agent) intellects.

There is evidence of some evolution in Ibn Rushd's thought on the intellect, notably in his Middle Commentary on De Anima where he combines the positions of Alexander and Themistius for his doctrine on the material intellect and in his Long Commentary and the Tahafut where Ibn Rushd rejected Alexander and endorsed Themistius’ position that "material intellect is a single incorporeal eternal substance that becomes attached to the imaginative faculties of individual humans." Thus, the human soul is a separate substance ontologically identical with the active intellect; and when this active intellect is embodied in an individual human it is the material intellect. The material intellect is analogous to prime matter, in that it is pure potentiality able to receive universal forms. As such, the human mind is a composite of the material intellect and the passive intellect, which is the third element of the intellect. The passive intellect is identified with the imagination, which, as noted above, is the sense-connected finite and passive faculty that receives particular sensual forms. When the material intellect is actualized by information received, it is described as the speculative (habitual) intellect. As the speculative intellect moves towards perfection, having the active intellect as an object of thought, it becomes the acquired intellect. In that, it is aided by the active intellect, perceived in the way Aristotle had taught, to acquire intelligible thoughts. The idea of the soul's perfection occurring through having the active intellect as a greater object of thought is introduced elsewhere, and its application to religious doctrine is seen. In the Tahafut, Ibn Rushd speaks of the soul as a faculty that comes to resemble the focus of its intention, and when its attention focuses more upon eternal and universal knowledge, it become more like the eternal and universal. As such, when the soul perfects itself, it becomes like our intellect. This, of course, has impact on Ibn Rushd’s doctrine of the afterlife. Leaman contends that Ibn Rushd understands the process of knowing as a progression of detachment from the material and individual to become a sort of generalized species, in which the soul may survive death. This contradicts traditional religious views of the afterlife, which Ibn Rushd determines to be valuable in a political sense, in that it compels citizens to ethical behavior.

Elsewhere, Ibn Rushd maintains that it is the Muslim doctrine of the afterlife that best motivates people to an ethical life. The Christian and Jewish doctrines, he notes, are too focused upon the spiritual elements of the afterlife, while the Muslim description of the physical pleasures are more enticing. Of course, Ibn Rushd does not ultimately reject the idea of a physical afterlife, but for him it is unlikely.

A number of other problems remain in Ibn Rushd's doctrine of the soul and intellect. For instance, if the material intellect is one and eternal for all humans, how is it divided and individualized? His immediate reply was that division can only occur within material forms, thus it is the human body that divides and individualizes the material intellect. Nevertheless, aside from this and other problems raised, on some of which Aquinas takes him to task, Ibn Rushd succeeded in providing an explanation of the human soul and intellect that did not involve an immediate transcendent agent. This opposed the explanations found among the Neoplatonists, allowing a further argument for rejecting Neoplatonic emanation theories. Even so, notes Davidson, Ibn Rushd’s theory of the material intellect was something foreign to Aristotle.

8. Conclusion

The events surrounding Ibn Rushd towards the end of his life, including his banishment, signaled a broader cultural shift in the Islamic world. Interest in philosophy was primarily among the elite: scholars, royal patrons and civil servants. Nevertheless, its presence among the ruling elite spoke of the diversity of what it meant to be "Muslim." As interest in philosophy waned in the Muslim world after Ibn Rushd, his writings found new existence and intellectual vigor in the work of Christian and Jewish philosophers. The twelfth and thirteenth centuries saw an intellectual revival in the Latin West, with the first great universities being established in Italy, France and England. Within the walls of the University of Paris, a group of philosophers came to identify themselves with the Aristotelian philosophy presented by Ibn Rushd, particularly certain elements of its relation to religion. Later known as the "Averroists," these Christian philosophers sparked a controversy within the Roman Catholic Church about the involvement of philosophy with theology. Averroists, their accusers charged, had promoted the doctrines of one intellect for all humans, denial of the immortality of the soul, claimed that happiness can be found in this life and promoted the innovative doctrine of “double truth”. Double truth, the idea that there are two kinds of truth, religious and philosophical, was not held by Ibn Rushd himself but was an innovation of the Averroists.

Among Jewish thinkers, however, Ibn Rushd had a more positive impact. His thoughts on Aristotle and the relationship between philosophy and religion, particularly revelation, inspired a renewed interest in the interpretation of scripture and the Jewish religion. Key Jewish philosophers, such as Maimonides, Moses Narboni and Abraham ibn Ezra, became associated with Ibn Rushd in the West, even though they took Ibn Rushd's doctrines into novel directions. As such, Leaman notes, the category of a Jewish "Averroist" cannot be given to these philosophers, for their relationship with Ibn Rushd’s thought was one of critique and integration into their own philosophical systems. Nevertheless, without the work of the Spanish-Muslim philosopher, much of what occurred in medieval philosophy would have not existed. He became an example of how religions are dynamic and evolving traditions, often shaped by epistemological influences from other traditions.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Ibn Rushd, with Commentary by Moses Narboni, The Epistle on the Possibility of Conjunction with the Active Intellect. K. Bland (trans.). (New York: Jewish Theological Seminary of America, 1982).
  • Ibn Rushd, Decisive Treatise & Epistle Dedicatory. C. Butterworth (trans.). (Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2001).
  • Ibn Rushd, Faith and Reason in Islam [al-Kashf]. I. Najjar (trans.). (Oxford: Oneworld, 2001).
  • Ibn Rushd, Long Commentary on Aristotle's De Anima. A. Hyman (trans.), Philosophy in the Middle Ages (Cambridge: Hackett, 1973).
  • Ibn Rushd, Middle Commentary on Aristotle's Categories and De Interpretatione. C. Butterworth (trans.). (South Bend: St. Augustine’s Press, 1998).
  • Ibn Rushd, Tahafut al-Tahafut. S. Van Den Bergh (trans.). (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1954).
  • Ibn Rushd, Treatise Concerning the Substance of the Celestial Sphere. A. Hyman (trans.), Philosophy in the Middle Ages (Cambridge: Hackett, 1973).

b. Secondary Sources

  • J. Al-Alawi, "The Philosophy of Ibn Rushd: the Evolution of the Problem of the Intellect in the works of Ibn Rushd." Jayyusi, Salma Khadra (ed.), The Legacy of Muslim Spain, (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1994).
  • R. Arnaldez, Ibn Rushd: A Rationalist in Islam (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1998)
  • A. Benmakhlour, Ibn Rushd (Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2000)
  • D. Black, "Ibn Rushd, the Incoherence of the Incoherence." The Classics of Western Philosophy: a Reader's Guide. Eds. Jorge Gracia, Gregory Reichberg and Bernard Schumacher (Oxford: Blackwell, 2003).
  • D. Black "Consciousness and Self-Knowledge in Aquinas's Critique of Ibn Rushd’s Psychology." Journal of the History of Philosophy 31.3 (July 1993): 23-59.
  • D. Black, "Memory, Time and Individuals in Ibn Rushd's Psychology." Medieval Theology and Philosophy 5 (1996): 161-187
  • H. Davidson, Alfarabi, Avicenna, and Ibn Rushd, on Intellect: Their Cosmologies, Theories of the Active Intellect and Theories of Human Intellect (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • C. Genequand, "Metaphysics." History of Islamic Philosophy. S. Nasr and O. Leaman (eds.). (New York: Routledge, 2001).
  • M. Hayoun et A. de Libera, Ibn Rushd et l'Averroisme (Paris: Presses Universitaries de France, 1991).
  • A. Hughes, The Texture of the Divine: Imagination in Medieval Islamic and Jewish Thought (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003)
  • M. Fakhry, A History of Islamic Philosophy (New York: Columbia University Press, 1983)
  • M. Fakhry, Ibn Rushd (Ibn Rushd) (Oxford: Oneworld, 2001)
  • M. Fakhry, Islamic Occasionalism: and its Critique by Ibn Rushd and Aquinas (London: George Allen & Unwin, 1958).
  • I. Lapidus, A History of Islamic Societies (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1988)
  • O. Leaman, Ibn Rushd and His Philosophy (New York: Oxford University Press, 1988)
  • O. Leaman, An Introduction to Classical Islamic Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002)
  • O. Leaman, "Ibn Rushd" Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy Vol. 4. E. Craig (gen. ed.) (London: Routledge, 1998).
  • O. Mohammed, Ibn Rushd's Doctrine of Immortality: a Matter of Controversy (Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier Press, 1984).
  • D. Urvoy, "Ibn Rushd." History of Islamic Philosophy. S. Nasr and O. Leaman (eds.). (New York: Routledge, 2001).
  • D. Urvoy, Ibn Rushd (Ibn Rushd) (London: Routledge, 1991).

Author Information

H. Chad Hillier
University of Toronto

Avicenna (Ibn Sina) (c. 980—1037)

AvicennaAbu ‘Ali al-Husayn ibn Sina is better known in Europe by the Latinized name “Avicenna.” He is probably the most significant philosopher in the Islamic tradition and arguably the most influential philosopher of the pre-modern era. Born in Afshana near Bukhara in Central Asia in about 980, he is best known as a polymath, as a physician whose major work the Canon (al-Qanun fi’l-Tibb) continued to be taught as a medical textbook in Europe and in the Islamic world until the early modern period, and as a philosopher whose major summa the Cure (al-Shifa’) had a decisive impact upon European scholasticism and especially upon Thomas Aquinas (d. 1274). Primarily a metaphysical philosopher of being who was concerned with understanding the self’s existence in this world in relation to its contingency, Ibn Sina’s philosophy is an attempt to construct a coherent and comprehensive system that accords with the religious exigencies of Muslim culture. As such, he may be considered to be the first major Islamic philosopher. The philosophical space that he articulates for God as the Necessary Existence lays the foundation for his theories of the soul, intellect and cosmos. Furthermore, he articulated a development in the philosophical enterprise in classical Islam away from the apologetic concerns for establishing the relationship between religion and philosophy towards an attempt to make philosophical sense of key religious doctrines and even analyse and interpret the Qur’an. Recent studies have attempted to locate him within the Aristotelian and Neoplatonic traditions. His relationship with the latter is ambivalent: although accepting some keys aspects such as an emanationist cosmology, he rejected Neoplatonic epistemology and the theory of the pre-existent soul. However, his metaphysics owes much to the "Amonnian" synthesis of the later commentators on Aristotle and discussions in legal theory and kalam on meaning, signification and being. Apart from philosophy, Avicenna’s other contributions lie in the fields of medicine, the natural sciences, musical theory, and mathematics. In the Islamic sciences ('ulum), he wrote a series of short commentaries on selected Qur’anic verses and chapters that reveal a trained philosopher’s hermeneutical method and attempt to come to terms with revelation. He also wrote some literary allegories about whose philosophical value recent scholarship is vehemently at odds.

His influence in medieval Europe spread through the translations of his works first undertaken in Spain. In the Islamic world, his impact was immediate and led to what Michot has called "la pandémie avicennienne." When al-Ghazali  led the theological attack upon the heresies of the philosophers, he singled out Avicenna, and a generation later when the Shahrastani gave an account of the doctrines of the philosophers of Islam, he relied upon the work of Avicenna, whose metaphysics he later attempted to refute in his Struggling against the Philosophers (Musari‘at al-falasifa). Avicennan metaphysics became the foundation for discussions of Islamic philosophy and philosophical theology. In the early modern period in Iran, his metaphysical positions began to be displayed by a creative modification that they underwent due to the thinkers of the school of Isfahan, in particular Mulla Sadra (d. 1641).

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Times
  2. Works
  3. Avicenna Latinus
  4. Logic
  5. Ontology
  6. Epistemology
  7. Psychology
  8. Mysticism and Oriental Philosophy
  9. The Avicennan Tradition and His Legacy
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. The Latin Avicenna (mainly sections of al-Shifa')
    2. Studies in Avicenna Latinus
    3. Selected Works of Avicenna Available in European Language Translation
    4. General Introductions to Avicenna and His Thought
    5. Collections and Bibliographies
    6. Interpretations
    7. Avicenna's Oriental Philosophy
    8. Metaphysics
    9. On Pyschology
    10. Existence-Essence

1. Life and Times

Sources on his life range from his autobiography, written at the behest of his disciple ‘Abd al-Wahid Juzjani, his private correspondence, including the collection of philosophical epistles exchanged with his disciples and known as al-Mubahathat (The Discussions), to legends and doxographical views embedded in the ‘histories of philosophy’ of medieval Islam such as Ibn al-Qifti’s Ta’rikh al-hukama (History of the Philosophers) and Zahir al-Din Bayhaqi’s Tatimmat Siwan al-hikma. However, much of this material ought to be carefully examined and critically evaluated. Gutas has argued that the autobiography is a literary device to represent Avicenna as a philosopher who acquired knowledge of all the philosophical sciences through study and intuition (al-hads), a cornerstone of his epistemological theory. Thus the autobiography is an attempt to demonstrate that humans can achieve the highest knowledge through intuition. The text is a key to understanding Avicenna’s view of philosophy: we are told that he only understood the purpose of Aristotle’s Metaphysics after reading al-Farabi’s short treatise on it, and that often when he failed to understand a problem or solve the syllogism, he would resort to prayer in the mosque (and drinking wine at times) to receive the inspiration to understand – the doctrine of intuition. We will return to his epistemology later but first what can we say about his life?

Avicenna was born in around 980 in Afshana, a village near Bukhara in Transoxiana. His father, who may have been Ismaili, was a local Samanid governor. At an early age, his family moved to Bukhara where he studied Hanafi jurisprudence (fiqh) with Isma‘il Zahid (d. 1012) and medicine with a number of teachers. This training and the excellent library of the physicians at the Samanid court assisted Avicenna in his philosophical self-education. Thus, he claimed to have mastered all the sciences by the age of 18 and entered into the service of the Samanid court of Nuh ibn Mansur (r. 976-997) as a physician. After the death of his father, it seems that he was also given an administrative post. Around the turn of the millennium, he moved to Gurganj in Khwarazm, partly no doubt to the eclipse of Samanid rule after the Qarakhanids took Bukhara in 999. He then left again ‘through necessity’ in 1012 for Jurjan in Khurasan to the south in search no doubt for a patron. There he first met his disciple and scribe Juzjani. After a year, he entered Buyid service as a physician, first with Majd al-Dawla in Rayy and then in 1015 in Hamadan where he became vizier of Shams al-Dawla. After the death of the later in 1021, he once again sought a patron and became the vizier of the Kakuyid ‘Ala’ al-Dawla for whom he wrote an important Persian summa of philosophy, the Danishnama-yi ‘Ala’i (The Book of Knowledge for ‘Ala’ al-Dawla). Based in Isfahan, he was widely recognized as a philosopher and physician and often accompanied his patron on campaign. It was during one of these to Hamadan in 1037 that he died of colic. An arrogant thinker who did not suffer fools, he was fond of his slave-girls and wine, facts which were ammunition for his later detractors.

2. Works

Avicenna wrote his two earliest works in Bukhara under the influence of al-Farabi. The first, a Compendium on the Soul (Maqala fi’l-nafs), is a short treatise dedicated to the Samanid ruler that establishes the incorporeality of the rational soul or intellect without resorting to Neoplatonic insistence upon its pre-existence. The second is his first major work on metaphysics, Philosophy for the Prosodist (al-Hikma al-‘Arudiya) penned for a local scholar and his first systematic attempt at Aristotelian philosophy.

He later wrote three ‘encyclopaedias’encyclopedias of philosophy. The first of these is al-Shifa’ (The Cure), a work modelled on the corpus of the philosopher, namely. Aristotle, that covers the natural sciences, logic, mathematics, metaphysics and theology. It was this work that through its Latin translation had a considerable impact on scholasticism. It was solicited by Juzjani and his other students in Hamadan in 1016 and although he lost parts of it on a military campaign, he completed it in Isfahan by 1027. The other two encyclopaedias were written later for his patron the Buyid prince ‘Ala’ al-Dawla in Isfahan. The first, in Persian rather than Arabic is entitled Danishnama-yi ‘Ala’i (The Book of Knowledge for ‘Ala’ al-Dawla) and is an introductory text designed for the layman. It closely follows his own Arabic epitome of The Cure, namely al-Najat (The Salvation). The Book of Knowledge was the basis of al-Ghazali’s later Arabic work Maqasid al-falasifa (Goals of the Philosophers). The second, whose dating and interpretation have inspired debates for centuries, is al-Isharat wa’l-Tanbihat (Pointers and Reminders), a work that does not present completed proofs for arguments and reflects his mature thinking on a variety of logical and metaphysical issues. According to Gutas it was written in Isfahan in the early 1030s; according to Michot, it dates from an earlier period in Hamadan and possibly Rayy. A further work entitled al-Insaf (The Judgement) which purports to represent a philosophical position that is radical and transcends AristotelianisingAristotle’s Neoplatonism is unfortunately not extant, and debates about its contents are rather like the arguments that one encounters concerning Plato’s esoteric or unwritten doctrines. One further work that has inspired much debate is The Easterners (al-Mashriqiyun) or The Eastern Philosophy (al-Hikma al-Mashriqiya) which he wrote at the end of the 1020s and is mostly lost.

3. Avicenna Latinus

Avicenna’s major work, The Cure, was translated into Latin in 12th and 13th century Spain (Toledo and Burgos) and, although it was controversial, it had an important impact and raised controversies inin medieval scholastic philosophy. In certain cases the Latin manuscripts of the text predate the extant Arabic ones and ought to be considered more authoritative. The main significance of the Latin corpus lies in the interpretation for Avicennism andAvicennism, in particular forregarding his doctrines on the nature of the soul and his famous existence-essence distinction (more about that below) andbelow), along with the debates and censure that they raised in scholastic Europe, in particular in ParisEurope. This was particularly the case in Paris, where Avicennism waslater proscribed in 1210. However, the influence of his psychology and theory of knowledge upon William of Auvergne and Albertus Magnus have been noted. More significant is the impact of his metaphysics upon the work and thought of Thomas Aquinas. His other major work to be translated into Latin was his medical treatise the Canon, which remained a text-book into the early modern period and was studied in centrescenters of medical learning such as Padua.

4. Logic

Logic is a critical aspect of, and propaedeutic to, Avicennan philosophy. His logical works follow the curriculum of late Neoplatonism and comprise nine books, beginning with his version of Porphyry’s Isagoge followed by his understanding and modification of the Aristotelian Organon, which included the Poetics and the Rhetoric. On the age-old debate whether logic is an instrument of philosophy (Peripatetic view) or a part of philosophy (Stoic view), he argues that such a debate is futile and meaningless.

His views on logic represent a significant metaphysical approach, and it could be argued generally that metaphysical concerns lead Avicenna’s arguments in a range of philosophical and non-philosophical subjects. For example, he argues in The Cure that both logic and metaphysics share a concern with the study of secondary intelligibles (ma‘qulat thaniya), abstract concepts such as existence and time that are derived from primary concepts such as humanity and animality. Logic is the standard by which concepts—or the mental "existence" that corresponds to things that occur in extra-mental reality—can be judged and hence has both implications for what exists outside of the mind and how one may articulate those concepts through language. More importantly, logic is a key instrument and standard for judging the validity of arguments and hence acquiring knowledge. Salvation depends on the purity of the soul and in particular the intellect that is trained and perfected through knowledge. Of particular significance for later debates and refutations is his notion that knowledge depends on the inquiry of essential definitions (hadd) through syllogistic reasoning. The problem of course arises when one tries to make sense of an essential definition in a real, particular world, and when one’s attempts to complete the syllogism by striking on the middle term is foiled because one’s ‘intuition’ fails to grasp the middle term.

5. Ontology

From al-Farabi, Avicenna inherited the Neoplatonic emanationist scheme of existence. Contrary to the classical Muslim theologians, he rejected creation ex nihilo and argued that cosmos has no beginning but is a natural logical product of the divine One. The super-abundant, pure Good that is the One cannot fail to produce an ordered and good cosmos that does not succeed him in time. The cosmos succeeds God merely in logical order and in existence.

Consequently, Avicenna is well known as the author of one an important and influential proof for the existence of God. This proof is a good example of a philosopher’s intellect being deployed for a theological purpose, as was common in medieval philosophy. The argument runs as follows: There is existence, or rather our phenomenal experience of the world confirms that things exist, and that their existence is non-necessary because we notice that things come into existence and pass out of it. Contingent existence cannot arise unless it is made necessary by a cause. A causal chain in reality must culminate in one un-caused cause because one cannot posit an actual infinite regress of causes (a basic axiom of Aristotelian science). Therefore, the chain of contingent existents must culminate in and find its causal principle in a sole, self-subsistent existent that is Necessary. This, of course, is the same as the God of religion.

An important corollary of this argument is Avicenna’s famous distinction between existence and essence in contingents, between the fact that something exists and what it is. It is a distinction that is arguably latent in Aristotle although the roots of Avicenna’s doctrine are best understood in classical Islamic theology or kalam. Avicenna’s theory of essence posits three modalities: essences can exist in the external world associated with qualities and features particular to that reality; they can exist in the mind as concepts associated with qualities in mental existence; and they can exist in themselves devoid of any mode of existence. This final mode of essence is quite distinct from existence. Essences are thus existentially neutral in themselves. Existents in this world exist as something, whether human, animal or inanimate object; they are ‘dressed’ in the form of some essence that is a bundle of properties that describes them as composites. God on the other hand is absolutely simple, and cannot be divided into a bundle of distinct ontological properties that would violate his unity. Contingents, as a mark of their contingency, are conceptual and ontological composites both at the first level of existence and essence and at the second level of properties. Contingent things in this world come to be as mentally distinct composites of existence and essence bestowed by the Necessary.

This proof from contingency is also sometimes termed “radical contingency.” Later arguments raged concerning whether the distinction was mental or real, whether the proof is ontological or cosmological. The clearest problem with Avicenna’s proofs lies in the famous Kantian objection to ontological arguments: is existence meaningful in itself? Further, Cantor’s solution to the problem of infinity may also be seen as a setback to the argument from the impossibility of actual infinites.

Avicenna’s metaphysics is generally expressed in Aristotelian terms. The quest to understand being qua being subsumes the philosophical notion of God. Indeed, as we have seen divine existence is a cornerstone of his metaphysics. Divine existence bestows existence and hence meaning and value upon all that exists. Two questions that were current were resolved through his theory of existence. First, theologians such as al-Ash‘ari and his followers were adamant in denying the possibility of secondary causality; for them, God was the sole agent and actor in all that unfolded. Avicenna’s metaphysics, although being highly deterministic because of his view of radical contingency, still insists of the importance of human and other secondary causality. Second, the age-old problem was discussed: if God is good, how can evil exist? Divine providence ensures that the world is the best of all possible worlds, arranged in the rational order that one would expect of a creator akin to the demiurge of the Timaeus. But while this does not deny the existence of evil in this world of generation and corruption, some universal evil does not exist because of the famous Neoplatonic definition of evil as the absence of good. Particular evils in this world are accidental consequences of good. Although this deals with the problem of natural evils, the problem of moral evils and particularly ‘horrendous’ evils remains.

6. Epistemology

The second most influential idea of Avicenna is his theory of the knowledge. The human intellect at birth is rather like a tabula rasa, a pure potentiality that is actualized through education and comes to know. Knowledge is attained through empirical familiarity with objects in this world from which one abstracts universal concepts. It is developed through a syllogistic method of reasoning; observations lead to prepositional statements, which when compounded lead to further abstract concepts. The intellect itself possesses levels of development from the material intellect (al-‘aql al-hayulani), that potentiality that can acquire knowledge to the active intellect (al-‘aql al-fa‘il), the state of the human intellect at conjunction with the perfect source of knowledge.

But the question arises: how can we verify if a proposition is true? How do we know that an experience of ours is veridical? There are two methods to achieve this.  First, there are the standards of formal inference of arguments —Is the argument logically sound? Second, and most importantly, there is a transcendent intellect in which all the essences of things and all knowledge resides. This intellect, known as the Active Intellect, illuminates the human intellect through conjunction and bestows upon the human intellect true knowledge of things. Conjunction, however, is episodic and only occurs to human intellects that have become adequately trained and thereby actualized. The active intellect also intervenes in the assessment of sound inferences through Avicenna’s theory of intuition. A syllogistic inference draws a conclusion from two prepositional premises through their connection or their middle term. It is sometimes rather difficult to see what the middle term is; thus when someone reflecting upon an inferential problem suddenly hits upon the middle term, and thus understands the correct result, she has been helped through intuition (hads) inspired by the active intellect. There are various objections that can be raised against this theory, especially because it is predicated upon a cosmology widely refuted in the post-Copernican world.

One of the most problematic implications of Avicennan epistemology relates to God’s knowledge. The divine is pure, simple and immaterial and hence cannot have a direct epistemic relation with the particular thing to be known. Thus Avicenna concluded while God knows what unfolds in this world, he knows things in a ‘universal manner’ through the universal qualities of things. God only knows kinds of existents and not individuals. This resulted in the famous condemnation by al-Ghazali who said that Avicenna’s theory amounts to a heretical denial of God’s knowledge of particulars. particulars.

7. Psychology

Avicenna’s epistemology is predicated upon a theory of soul that is independent of the body and capable of abstraction. This proof for the self in many ways prefigures by 600 years the Cartesian cogito and the modern philosophical notion of the self. It demonstrates the Aristotelian base and Neoplatonic structure of his psychology. This is the so-called ‘flying man’ argument or thought experiment found at the beginning of his Fi’-Nafs/De Anima (Treatise on the Soul). If a person were created in a perfect state, but blind and suspended in the air but unable to perceive anything through his senses, would he be able to affirm the existence of his self? Suspended in such a state, he cannot affirm the existence of his body because he is not empirically aware of it, thus the argument may be seen as affirming the independence of the soul from the body, a form of dualism. But in that state he cannot doubt that his self exists because there is a subject that is thinking, thus the argument can be seen as an affirmation of the self-awareness of the soul and its substantiality. This argument does raise an objection, which may also be levelled at Descartes: how do we know that the knowing subject is the self?

This rational self possesses faculties or senses in a theory that begins with Aristotle and develops through Neoplatonism. The first sense is common sense (al-hiss al-mushtarak) which fuses information from the physical senses into an epistemic object. The second sense is imagination (al-khayal) which processes the image of the perceived epistemic object. The third sense is the imaginative faculty (al-mutakhayyila) which combines images in memory, separates them and produces new images. The fourth sense is estimation or prehension (wahm) that translates the perceived image into its significance. The classic example for this innovative sense is that of the sheep perceiving the wolf and understanding the implicit danger. The final sense is where the ideas produced are stored and analyzed and ascribed meanings based upon the production of the imaginative faculty and estimation. Different faculties do not compromise the singular integrity of the rational soul. They merely provide an explanation for the process of intellection.

8. Mysticism and Oriental Philosophy

Was Avicenna a mystic? Some of his interpreters in Iran have answered in the positive, citing the lost work The Easterners that on the face of it has a superficial similarity to the notion of Ishraqi or Illuminationist, intuitive philosophy expounded by Suhrawardi (d. 1191) and the final section of Pointers that deal with the terminology of mysticism and Sufism. The question does not directly impinge on his philosophy so much since The Easterners is mostly non-extant. But it is an argument relating to ideology and the ways in which modern commentators and scholars wish to study Islamic philosophy as a purely rational form of inquiry or as a supra-rational method of understanding reality. Gutas has been most vehement in his denial of any mysticism in Avicenna. For him, Avicennism is rooted in the rationalism of the Aristotelian tradition. Intuition does not entail mystical disclosure but is a mental act of conjunction with the active intellect. The notion of intuition is located itself by Gutas in Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics 89b10-11. While some of the mystical commentators of Avicenna have relied upon his pseudo-epigraphy (such as some sort of Persian Sufi treatises and the Mi‘rajnama), one ought not to throw the baby out with the bath water. The last sections of Pointers are significant evidence of Avicenna’s acceptance of some key epistemological possibilities that are present in mystical knowledge such as the possibility of non-discursive reason and simple knowledge. Although one can categorically deny that he was a Sufi (and indeed in his time the institutions of Sufism were not as established as they were a century later) and even raise questions about his adherence to some form of mysticism, it would be foolish to deny that he flirts with the possibilities of mystical knowledge in some of his later authentic works.

9. The Avicennan Tradition and His Legacy

Avicenna’s major achievement was to propound a philosophically defensive system rooted in the theological fact of Islam, and its success can be gauged by the recourse to Avicennan ideas found in the subsequent history of philosophical theology in Islam. In the Latin West, his metaphysics and theory of the soul had a profound influence on scholastic arguments, and as in the Islamic East, was the basis for considerable debate and argument. Just two generations after him, al-Ghazali (d. 1111) and al-Shahrastani (d. 1153) in their attacks testify to the fact that no serious Muslim thinker could ignore him. They regarded Avicenna as the principal representative of philosophy in Islam. In the later Iranian tradition, Avicenna’s thought was critically distilled with mystical insight, and he became known as a mystical thinker, a view much disputed in more recent scholarship. Nevertheless the major works of Avicenna, The Cure and Pointers, became the basis for the philosophical curriculum in the madrasa. Numerous commentaries, glosses and super-glosses were composed on them and continued to be produced into the 20th century. While our current views on cosmology, the nature of the self, and knowledge raise distinct problems for Avicennan ideas, they do not address the important issue of why his thought remained so influential for such a long period of time. In In recent times, Avicenna has been attacked by some contemporary Arab Muslim thinkers in search of a new rationalism within Arab culture, one that champions Averroes against Avicenna.

10. References and Further Reading

a. The Latin Avicenna (mainly sections of al-Shifa’)

  • Liber de anima seu sextus de naturalibus I-III. ed. Simone van Riet, Leiden, 1972.
  • Liber de philosophia prima sive scientia divina I-IV. ed. Simone van Riet, Leidin, 1977.
  • Liber de pilosophia prima sive scientia divina V-X. ed. Simone van Riet, Leiden, 1980.
  • Liber primus naturalium: Tractatus primus de causis et principiis naturalium. ed. Simone van Riet, Leiden, 1992.
  • Liber quartus naturalium de actionibus et passionibus qualitatum primarum. ed. Simone van Riet, Leiden, 1989.

b. Studies in Avicenna Latinus

  • (eds), Islam and the Italian Renaissance. eds. Charles Burnett and Anna Contadini. Warburg Institute, 1999.
  • N. G. Siraisi, Avicenna in Renaissance Italy: The Canon and Medical Teaching in Italian Universities after 1500, Princeton, 1987.
  • Dag Hasse, Avicenna’s De Anima in the Latin West, London, 2000.
    • A study of the impact of Avicennan psychology upon the scholastics focusing on five key issues

c. Selected Works of Avicenna Available in European Language Translation

  • Epistola sulla vita future (Risalat al-Adhawiyya fi’l-ma’ad), tr. F. Luchetta, Padua, 1969.
    • Compare it with this useful and critical commentary by the theologian Ibn Taymiyya (d. 1328) – Yahya Michot, ‘A Mamluk theologian’s commentary on Avicenna’s Risala Adhawiyya’, Journal of Islamic Studies 14 (2003), 149-203, 309-63.
  • The Life of Ibn Sina, tr. William Gohlman, Albany, 1974.
  • Avicenna’s De Anima (Fi’l-Nafs), tr. F. Rahman, London, 1954.
  • Livre de directives et remarques (al-Isharat wa’l-Tanbihat), tr. Anne-Marie Goichon, 2 vols., Paris, 1951.
  • Remarks and Admonitions Part One: Logic (al-Isharat wa’l-Tanbihat: mantiq), tr. Shams Inati, Toronto, 1984.
  • La Métaphysique du Shifa’ I-IV et V-X, tr. G. Anawati, Paris, 1978-86.
  • Le livre de science (Danishnama-yi ‘Ala’i) I: Logique, Métaphysique II: science naturelle, mathématique, trs. M. Achena and Henri Massé, Paris, 1986.
  • Ibn Sina on Mysticism (al-Isharat wa’l-Tanbihat namat IX), tr. Shams Inati, London, 1998.
  • The Metaphysica of Avicenna (Ilahiyyat-i Danishnama-yi ‘Ala’i), tr. Parviz Morewedge, New York, 1972; rpt., Binghamton, 2003.
  • Lettre au Vizier Abu Sa’d, ed./tr. Yahya Michot, Paris, 2000.
  • The Metaphysics of Avicenna (al-Ilahiyyat min Kitab al-Shifa’), ed./tr. Michael Marmura, Provo, 2004.

d. General Introductions to Avicenna and His Thought

  • Cruz Hernández, Miguel. La vida de Avicena. Salamanca, 1997.
    • A short and accessible intellectual biography written by perhaps the foremost Spanish historian of Islamic philosophy.
  • Goichon, Anne-Marie. Lexique de la langue philosophique d’Avicenne. Paris, 1938.
    • A pioneering work which remains a highly useful research tool.
  • Goodman, Lenn. Avicenna. London, 1992.
    • Although an attempt by a contemporary philosopher to come to grips with the enduring contributions of Avicenna to philosophy, it suffers from some serious textual misreadings.
  • Gutas, Dimitri. Avicenna and the Aristotelian Tradition. Leiden/Boston, 1988.
    • A solid work of scholarship that discusses Avicenna’s corpus and thought within a paradigm of Islamic Aristotelianism.
  • Nasr, Sayyed Hossein. Three Muslim Sages. Cambridge, 1966.
    • An old and contentious presentation of Avicenna as a polymath rooted in the mystical experience of God.
  • Sebti, Miriam. Avicenne. Paris, 2003.
    • An interpretation from a continental philosophical approach.
  • Street, Tony. Avicenna. Cambridge, 2005.
    • A solid presentation of the key ideas based on the most up-to-date research.

e. Collections and Bibliographies

  • Special Issue of Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale. Padua, 8 (1997) on Avicenna.
  • Special Issue of Arabic Sciences and Philosophy. Cambridge, 10 (2000) on Avicenna.
  • Anawati, G. C. Essai de bibliographie avicennienne. Cairo, 1950.
  • Various Authors, ‘Avicenna’, Encyclopaedia Iranica. New York, II, 66-110.
  • Janssens, Jules. Bibliography of Works on Ibn Sina, 2 vols. Leiden, 1991-99.
  • Janssens, Jules and Daniel de Smet (ed). Avicenna and His Heritage. Leuven, 2001.
    • Proceedings from a 1999 conference that brought together specialists on the Arabic and the Latin Avicenna and their legacies.
  • Rashed, Roshdi and Jean Jolivet (eds), Etudes sur Avicenne, Paris, 1984.
    • An excellent collection that includes insightful pieces on Avicennan physics and metaphysics.
  • David Reisman and Ahmed al-Rahim (eds), Before and After Avicenna, Leiden/Boston, 2003.
    • The proceedings of the First Conference of the Avicenna Research Group (based at Yale).
  • Robert Wisnovsky (ed), Aspects of Avicenna (Princeton Papers: Interdisciplinary Journal of Middle East Studies, 9), Princeton, 2001.
    • Includes two good pieces on Avicennan psychology.

f. Interpretations

  • Arberry, Arthur J. Avicenna on Theology. London, 1954.
    • Includes translations of texts and raises the interesting question of what is ‘Islamic’ about Avicenna’s ‘Islamic philosophy’.
  • Corbin, Henry. Avicenna and the Visionary Recital, Princeton, 1961.
    • An influential and controversial interpretation of Avicenna through the lens of the later Iranian tradition portraying him as a mystic.
  • Gardet, Louis. La pensée religieuse d’Avicenne, Paris, 1951.
  • Heath, Peter. Allegory and Philosophy in Avicenna, Philadelphia, 1992.
    • An interesting approach to allegory that draws on Corbin and suffers from the assumption that the famous pseudo-Avicennan work the Mi’rajnama is authentic.
  • Lüling, G. ‘Die anderer Avicenna’, Zeitschrift der deutschen MorganländischenGesellschaft Suppl III.1 (1977), 496-513.
  • Marmura, Michael. ‘Avicenna and the kalam’, Zeitschrift für arabisch-islamisch Wissenschaft (Frankfurt) 7 (1991-2), 172-206.
    • Considers Avicenna’s debt to the metaphysics of kalam.
  • Marmura, Michael. ‘Plotting the course of Avicenna’s thought’, Journal of the American Oriental Society 111 (1991), 333-42.
    • A critical assessment of Gutas’s 1988 work.
  • Michot, Yahya. ‘La pandémie avicennienne’, Arabica (Paris) 40 (1993), 287-344.
    • On the widespread hegemony of Avicennan philosophy in Islamic thought from the 12th Century.
  • Thom, Paul. Medieval Modal Systems, London, 2004.
    • The best study of Avicenna’s modal logic and his contributions to the field.

g. Avicenna’s Oriental Philosophy

  • Cruz Hernández, Miguel. ‘El problema de la “auténtica” filosofía de Avicena’, Revista de Filosofía 5 (1992), 235-56.
  • Gutas, Dimitri. ‘Avicenna’s Eastern (“Oriental”) Philosophy’, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy 10 (2000), 159-80.
  • Nasr, Seyyed Hossein. ‘Ibn Sina’s Oriental Philosophy’, in S. H. Nasr and Oliver Leaman (eds), History of Islamic Philosophy, London/New York, 1996, I, 247-51.
    • A classic restatement of Nasr’s mystical understanding of Avicenna.
  • Pines, Shlomo. ‘La philosophie orientale d’Avicenne’, in The Collected Works of Shlomo Pines Volume III, Jerusalem, 1996, 301-33.
    • Interprets ‘oriental’ to signify an Eastern alternative Peripatetism.

h. Metaphysics

  • Robert Wisnovsky, Avicenna’s Metaphysics in Context, London, 2003.
    • An excellent study that locates the origins of Avicennan thought in what he calls the ‘Ammonian synthesis’ in Late Antiquity and then explains the development of Avicennan metaphysics.

i. On Psychology

  • Helmut Gätje, Studien zur Überlieferung der aristotelische Psychologie im Islam, Heidelberg, 1971.
    • A pioneering study of the key aspects of Aristotelian(ising) psychological theories in Islamic philosophy focusing on Avicenna.
  • Dag Hasse, Avicenna’s De Anima in the Latin West, London, 2000.
    • A study of the impact of Avicennan psychology upon the scholastics focusing on five key issues.
  • Michot, Jean R. La destinée de l’homme selon Avicenne, Brussels, 1986.
    • A key investigation of Avicennan psychology as a quest for an Islamic answer to the problem of the soul’s journey beyond this life and the persistence of personal identity.
  • Rahman, Fazlur. Avicenna’s Psychology, London, 1952.
    • A study that includes a translation of Avicenna’s De Anima.

j. Existence-Essence

  • Goichon, Anne-Maria. La distinction de l’essence et l’existence d’après ibn Sina (Avicenne), Paris, 1937.
  • Mayer, Toby. ‘Ibn Sina’s Burhan al-Siddiqin’, Journal of Islamic Studies 12 (2001), 18-39.
  • Parviz Morewedge, ‘Philosophical analysis of Ibn Sina’s essence-existence distinction’, Journal of the American Oriental Society 92 (1972), 42-35.
  • Rahman, Fazlur. ‘Essence and existence in Avicenna’, Mediaeval Studies (Toronto) 4 (1958), 1-16.
  • Rahman, Fazlur. ‘Essence and existence in Ibn Sina: the myth and the reality’, Hamdard Islamicus (Karachi) 4 (1981), 3-14.
  • Rizvi, Sajjad. ‘Roots of an aporia in later Islamic philosophy: the existence-essence distinction in the philosophies of Avicenna and Suhrawardi’, Studia Iranica (Paris) 29 (2000), 61-108.

Author Information

Sajjad H. Rizvi
University of Bristol
United Kingdom

Ismaili Philosophy

Ismailism belongs to the Shi‘a main stream of Islam. Recent scholarship, based on a more judicious analysis of primary sources, has shown how Ismaili thought was in constant interaction with and to a certain extent influenced well-known currents of Islamic philosophy, theology, and mysticism.

Shi‘i and Ismaili philosophy use ta’wil as a tool of interpretation of scripture. This Qur’anic term connotes going back to the original meaning of the Qur’an. The objective of Ismaili thought is to create a bridge between Hellenic philosophy and religion. The human intellect is engaged to retrieve and disclose that which is interior or hidden (batin).

Ismailism presents a cosmology within an adapted Neoplatonic framework but tries to create an alternative synthesis. The starting point of such a synthesis is the doctrine of ibda‘ (derived from Qur’an 2:117). In its verbal form it is taken to mean 'eternal existentiation' to explain the notion in the Qur’an of God’s timeless command (Kun: ‘Be!’). The process of creation can be said to take place at several levels. Ibda‘ represents the initial level. The human intellect eventually relates to creation and tries to penetrate the mystery of the unknowable God.

Human history operates cyclically. The function of the Prophet is to reveal the religious law (shari‘a) while the Imam unveils gradually to his disciples the inner meaning (batin) of the revelation through the ta’wil.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Language and Meaning: The Stance of Ismaili Philosophy
  3. Manifesting Transcendence: Knowledge of the Cosmos

1. Introduction

Ismailism belongs to the Shi‘a branch of Islam, and, in common with various Muslim interpretive communities, has been concerned with developing a philosophical discourse to elucidate foundational Qur’anic and Islamic beliefs and principles. It would, however, be misleading to label Ismaili and other Muslim philosophical stances, as has been done by some scholars in the past, simplistically as manifestations of "Ismaili/Muslim Neoplatonism," and "Ismaili/Muslim gnosticism," and so forth. While elements of these philosophical and spiritual schools were certainly appropriated, and common features may be evident in the expression and development of Ismaili as well as other ideas, it must be noted that they were applied within very different historical and intellectual contexts and that such ideas came to be quite dramatically transformed in their meaning, purpose and significance in Islamic philosophy.

By those who were hostile to it or opposed its philosophical and intellectual stance, the Ismailis were regarded as heretical; legends were fabricated about them and their teachings. Early Western scholarship on Islamic philosophy inherited some of the biases of some medieval Muslim anti-philosophical stances, which tended to project a negative image of Ismailism, perceiving its philosophical contribution as having been derived from sources and tendencies 'alien' to Islam. Recent scholarship, based on a more judicious analysis of primary sources, provides a balanced perspective, and has shown how Ismaili thought was in constant interaction with and to a certain extent influenced well-known currents of Islamic philosophy and theology. Their views represent a consensus that it is inappropriate to treat Ismailism as a marginal school of Islamic thought; rather it constitutes a significant philosophical branch, among others, in Islamic philosophy.

Early Ismaili philosophy works dating back to the Fatimid period (fourth/tenth to sixth/twelfth century) are in Arabic; Nasir Khusraw (d. 471/1078) was the only Ismaili writer of the period to write in Persian. The Arabic tradition was continued in Yemen and India by the Musta‘li branch and in Syria by the Nizaris. In Persia and in Central Asia, the tradition was preserved and elaborated in Persian. Elsewhere among the Ismailis, local oral languages and literatures played an important part, though no strictly philosophical writings were developed in these languages.

2. Language and Meaning: The Stance of Ismaili Philosophy

Among the tools of interpretation of scripture that are associated particularly with Shi‘i and Ismaili philosophy is that of ta’wil. The application of this Qur’anic term, which connotes "going back to the first/the beginning," marks the effort in Ismaili thought of creating a philosophical and hermeneutical discourse that establishes the intellectual discipline for approaching revelation and creates a bridge between philosophy and religion.

Philosophy as conceived in Ismaili thought thus seeks to extend the meaning of religion and revelation to identify the visible and the apparent (zahir) and also to penetrate to the roots, to retrieve and disclose that which is interior or hidden (batin). Ultimately, this discovery engages both the intellect (‘aql) and the spirit (ruh), functioning in an integral manner to illuminate and disclose truths (haqa’iq).

The appropriate mode of language which serves us best in this task is, according to Ismaili philosophers, symbolic language. Such language, which employs analogy, metaphor and symbols, allows one to make distinctions and to establish differences in ways that a literal reading of language does not permit. Such language employs a special system of signs, the ultimate meaning of which can be 'unveiled' by the proper application of hermeneutics (ta’wil).

3. Manifesting Transcendence: Knowledge of the Cosmos

It has been argued that Ismaili cosmology, integrates a manifestational cosmology (analogous to some aspects of Stoic thought) within an adapted Neoplatonic framework to create an alternative synthesis. The starting point of such a synthesis is the doctrine of ibda (derived from Qur’an 2:117). In its verbal form it is taken to mean 'eternal existentiation' to explain the notion in the Qur’an of God’s timeless command (Kun: Be!). Ibda therefore connotes not a specific act of creation but the dialogical mode through which a relationship between God and His creation can be affirmed - it articulates the process of beginning and sets the stage for developing a philosophy of the manifestation of transcendence in creation.

In sum the process of creation can be said to take place at several levels. Ibda represents the initial level - one transcends history, the other creates it. The spiritual and material realms are not dichotomous, since in the Ismaili formulation, matter and spirit are united under a higher genus and each realm possesses its own hierarchy. Though they require linguistic and rational categories for definition, they represent elements of a whole, and a true understanding of God must also take account of His creation. Such a synthesis is crucial to how the human intellect eventually relates to creation and how it ultimately becomes the instrument for penetrating through history the mystery of the unknowable God implied in the formulation of tawhid.

Human history, as conceived in Ismailism, operates cyclically. According to this typological view, the epoch of the great prophets mirrors the cosmological paradigm, unfolding to recover the equilibrium and harmony inherent in the divine pattern of creation. Prophets and, after them, their appointed successors, the imams, have as their collective goal the establishment of a just society. The function of the Prophet is to initiate the cycle for human society and of the Imam to complement and interpret the teaching to sustain the just order at the social and individual levels.

As Nasir Khusraw, the best known of the Ismaili writers in Persian, states in a passage paraphrased by Corbin:

Time is eternity measured by the movements of the heavens,
whose name is day, night, month, year. Eternity is Time not
measured, having neither beginning nor end…The cause of Time
is the Soul of the World….; it is not in time, for time is
in the horizon of the soul as its instrument, as the duration
of the living mortal who is "the shadow of the soul", while
eternity is the duration of the living immortal - that is to
say of the Intelligence and of the Soul.

This synthesis of time as cycle and time as arrow lies at the heart of an Ismaili philosophy of active engagement in the world.

Author Information

Azim Nanji
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Nasir Khusraw (1004—1060)

Abu Mo’in Hamid al-Din Nasir ibn Khusraw is an important figure in the development of Ismaili philosophy. Much of his biography and philosophical ideology has been obtained through fragmented texts, both in poetry and prose.  Born into a politically connected family, Khusraw was well-educated and in the sciences and humanities.  Having spent most of his life occupying prestigious positions within the Sajuq court, Khusraw converted to the Ismaili faith at the age of forty after careful study.  He spent the rest of his life writing and advocating for the Ismaili faith, and eventually was forced into exile by Sunni authorities.

Consistent with other Ismaili philosopher, Khusraw’s cosmology is heavily inspired by Neoplatonism.  His metaphysics describes a God from which everything emanates and consistently strives back towards.  Through God, existence is cast into being through Universal Soul and Universal Intellect.  Each of these concepts provides the foundation for material objects, ascending from minerals to human beings.  Within each human being exists a soul and intellect, imperfect in form but existing within the Universals.   Khusraw interweaves his metaphysics within the Shi’i doctrine, requiring a divinely inspired guide to assist us in our journey to reconnect with Universal Intellect and Soul.  In holding to this cosmogonic description, Khusraw distinguishes his philosophy from previous Ismaili thought introduced by al-Farabi and picked up by Ibn Sina and al-Kirmani.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

In striking contrast to other Ismaili writers of the time (s.v., Hamid ai-din al Kirmani; Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani), many sources of information exist pertaining to Khusraw’s life.   Documentation was recorded,  with vary degrees of accuracy, by Khusraw himself, a (hostile) contemporary, and by later historians.  Since his death, Khusraw has been included in every major literary or historical survey of Ismailism.  Khusraw's life can be divided into four periods: his early years up to the age of forty (discernible from fragments of various texts); his conversion to Ismailism (of which he has left two different versions in the form of prose and poetry); his seven-year journey (documented in Safarnama); and his years of preaching followed by persecution and exile (drawn primarily from his poetry, but also a few statements in his philosophical works).

In 1004, Abu Mo’in Hamid al-Din Nasir ibn Khusraw was born in Qobadiyan, the district of Marv, in the eastern Iranian province of Khurasan. Along with two of his brothers, Khusraw occupied a high position in the administrative ranks of the Saljuq court - reportedly in the revenue department.  Evidence also suggests that he was familiar with the court of previous dynasty, the Ghaznavids.  Based on the quality of his writings, he received an excellent education in the sciences, literatures and philosophies of his time, including the study of Greek and Neoplatonic philosophy.  In his writing, Khusraw reportes examining the doctrines of the different Islamic schools and not being satisfied until he found and understood the Ismaili faith.  As a result of his conversion to Ismailism he embarked on a seven-year journey, during which time he spent three years in the Ismaili court in Cairo under the Fatimid caliph, al-Mustansir (1029-1094). The Fatimid dynasty (909-1171) aimed at creating an Islamic state based on Ismaili tenets, and thus presented a direct theological and military challenge to the Sunni ‘Abbasid caliphate based in Baghdad. Khusraw left Cairo as the head (hujjat) of Ismaili missionary activities in his home province of Khurasan.  After leaving Cairo, Khusraw was forced into exile by the Sunni authorities.  He spent the rest of his life exiled in the Pamir Mountains in Badakhshan, located in modern-day Tajikistan and Afghanistan.

2. Philosophy

Khusraw’s philosophical works reveal a strong Neoplatonic structure and vocabulary.  For example, his cosmogony closely follows Plotinus, moving from God and God’s word (logos) to Intellect, Soul, and the world of Nature.  Underlying each of the Ismaili cosmogonic systems is a fundamental division of the world into two realms, the esoteric (batin) and the exoteric (zahir).  From this division, everything in the physical world points to its counterpart in the spiritual, which is seen as its source, or true form.  The cosmogonic structure itself reveals a purposeful, providential unfolding from the spiritual realm into the physical world.  Conversely, as a reflection, the physical world seeks to grasp the spiritual realm and comprehend it.    In holding to this cosmogonic description, Khusraw follows his fellow Ismailis (Nasafi and al-Sijistani) while differentiating his theory from the structure introduced by al-Farabi and later adopted by Ibn Sina and the Ismaili philosopher al-Kirmani.

Khusraw begins with a discussion of tawhid (oneness, God’s unity), the clear understanding of which is the only way to achieve spiritual perfection. For Nasir, God Himself is indescribable beyond all categories of being and non-being (nothing which has an opposite can be ascribed to Him, since that would be limiting Him to human concepts).   However, from God emerges his Word (kalmia), ‘Be!’, which brings into existence Universal Intellect, perfect in potentiality and actuality.  Universal Intellect transcends time and space,  containing all being within itself.  Universal Intellect enjoys a worshipful intimacy with God and derives perfection from this intimacy.  From this worship emerges Universal Soul, perfect in potentiality but not in actuality because it is separated from God by Intellect.  Universal Soul recognizes its separation from God, and moves closer to God in a desire for the perfection enjoyed by Intellect.  Through its search for perfection, Universal Soul introduces the first movement into the entire structure, manifest in time and space.

The entire cosmos is set into motion through the movement of Universal Soul.  As a corollary, being is differentiated into two sets of opposites:  hot and cold, wet and dry.  Derived from these sets of opposites are the four elements: earth, air, fire, and water.  From these four elements arise the successive development of   minerals, plants, and animals.  Finally, as the summit of physical creation, human beings arise.  Within each human being exists an individual intellect and individual soul manifesting the same characteristics (but on a smaller level) as the universals.  In fact, the entire cosmos is formed on a matrix of Intellect and Soul; everything within the cosmos displays original intelligence and the search for perfection exhibited by the soul.

Khusraw’s ethics grow from and reflect this cosmogony. Each individual’s task is to recognize his or her own imperfections and then move to correct them, seeking the closest relationship possible with God.  For Khusraw, this is achieved by stringent and repeated application of the intellect to both physical and spiritual matters.  In order to correct these imperfections a believer must find a guide and study dilligently, perform all required religious acts with a full understanding, and supplement new understanding with higher levels of worldly activity.  As an Ismaili, Khusraw held the Shi‘i doctrine that God would not send a revelation without a guide to interpret it.  For the Ismailis, this guide must be a living person, the Imam of the Time.  As a living bridge between the two realms, this person must be divinely inspired, infallible, and perfectly capable of providing guidance in spiritual and worldly affairs.

3. References and Further Reading

The following sources elucidate Khusraw’s philosophy:

  • H. Corbin, "Nasir-i Khusrau and Iranian Ismailism," in The Cambridge History of Iran: Volume 4, ed., R. N. Frye (Cambridge 1975), pp. 520-42 and 689-90;
  • A. Hunsberger, "Nasir Khusraw: Fatimid Intellectual," in F. Daftary, ed., Intellectual Traditions in Islam (London 2000), pp. 112-29;
  • A. Hunsberger, Nasir Khusraw’s Doctrine of the Soul: From the Universal Intellect to the Physical World in Ismaili Philosophy, PhD thesis, Columbia University, New York, 1992;
  • S. Meskoob, Shahrokh, "The Origin and Meaning of ‘Aql (Reason) in the View of Nasir Khusraw," Iran Nameh, 6 (1989), pp. 239-57, and 7 (1989), pp. 405-29.

For a full bibliography of Nasir Khusraw’s works and ideas, see:

  • A. C. Hunsberger, Nasir Khusraw, the Ruby of Badakhshan: A Portrait of the Persian Poet, Traveller and Philosopher (London 2000).

For works still in manuscript, see:

  • I. K. Poonawala, Bibibliography of Ismaili Literature, Malibu, Calif., 1977, p. 123.

Author Information

Alice C. Hunsberger
Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani (d. 1020)

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani was a prominent Ismaili missionary during the reign of the Fatimid caliph-imam al-Hakim (996-1021). He was of Persian origin and was probably born in the province of Kirman. He seems to have spent the greater part of his life as a Fatimid da‘i (missionary) in Iraq (in Baghdad and Basra) and in central and western parts of Iran.Al-Kirmani was part of the official Fatimid campaign against the dissident da‘is, who had also proclaimed al-Hakim’s divinity. In Cairo he produced several works in refutation of the Druze movement and religion. Subsequently, al-Kirmani returned to Iraq where he completed his last and magnum opus, Rahat al-‘aql.

A prolific writer, al-Kirmani was one of the most learned Ismaili theologians of the Fatimid times. He was well-acquainted with the Hebrew text of the Old Testament, the Syriac version of the New Testament, and the post-Biblical Jewish writings. He expounded the Ismaili Shi‘i doctrine of the imamate in numerous writings. In a few treatises, al-Kirmani refuted the theological views of the Zaydis, the Twelver Shi‘is, and other Muslim opponents of the Fatimid Ismaili imams. Al-Kirmani was also an accomplished philosopher belonging to that select group of Ismaili da‘is of the Iranian lands who amalgamated in an original manner their Ismaili theology with different philosophical traditions, notably a type of Neoplatonism then current in the Muslim world.

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani was a prominent Ismaili da‘i or missionary and one of the most learned Ismaili theologians and philosophers of the Fatimid period. As in the case of other prominent missionaries who observed strict secrecy in their activities in the midst of hostile milieus, few biographical details are available on al-Kirmani, who flourished during the reign of the Fatimid caliph-imam al-Hakim (996-1021). Al-Kirmani is not mentioned in any contemporary Muslim historical sources, but highlights of his life and career can be gathered from his own numerous extant works as well as the writings of the later Musta‘li-Tayyibi Ismaili authors of Yaman.

Al-Kirmani’s date of birth remains unknown, but he was of Persian origin and was probably born in the province of Kirman. He seems to have spent the greater part of his life as a Fatimid da‘i in Iraq, having been particularly active in Baghdad and Basra. In Iraq, al-Kirmani successfully concentrated his efforts on local rulers and influential tribal chiefs, with whose support the Ismailis aimed to bring about the downfall of the ‘Abbasids. Alarmed by the successes of the Fatimid da‘wa or mission in Iraq, the ‘Abbasid caliph al-Qadir took retaliatory measures. In 1011, he sponsored the so-called Baghdad manifesto to discredit the Fatimids, also refuting their ‘Alid ancestry. The honorific title hujjat al-Iraqayn, meaning the hujja or chief da‘i of both Iraqs (al-Iraq al-Arabi and al-Iraq al-Ajami), which is often added to al-Kirmani’s name and may be of a late origin, implies that he was also active in central and western parts of Iran.

Al-Kirmani rose to prominence during the reign of al-Hakim, when the central headquarters of the Fatimid da‘wa in Cairo considered him as the most learned Ismaili theologian of the time. It was in that capacity that al-Kirmani played an important role in refuting the extremist ideas of some dissident da‘is, who were then founding what was to become known as the Druze movement and religion. As part of the official Fatimid campaign against the dissident da‘is, who had also proclaimed al-Hakim’s divinity, al-Kirmani was summoned in 1014 or shortly earlier to Cairo where he produced several works in refutation of the extremist doctrines. Al-Kirmani’s writings, which were widely circulated, were to some extent successful in checking the spread of the extremist doctrines associated with the initiation of the Druze movement. Subsequently, al-Kirmani returned to Iraq where he completed his last and magnum opus, Rahat al-‘aql, in 1020 and where he died soon afterwards.

A prolific writer, al-Kirmani was one of the most learned Ismaili theologians of the Fatimid times. He was well-acquainted with the Hebrew text of the Old Testament, the Syriac version of the New Testament, and the post-Biblical Jewish writings. He expounded the Ismaili Shi‘i doctrine of the imamate in numerous writings. In a few treatises, al-Kirmani refuted the theological views of the Zaydis, the Twelver Shi‘is, and other Muslim opponents of the Fatimid Ismaili imams. In his al-Aqwal al-dhahabiya, al-Kirmani refuted the ideas of Abu Bakr Mohammad b. Zakariya al-Razi (d. 934), who had argued for the necessity of revelation and prophethood while tracing all sciences to revelational origins. Al-Kirmani was also an accomplished philosopher belonging to that select group of Ismaili da‘is of the Iranian lands who amalgamated in an original manner their Ismaili theology (kalam) with different philosophical traditions, notably a type of Neoplatonism then current in the Muslim world. As a philosopher, al-Kirmani was fully acquainted with Aristotelian and Neoplatonic philosophies as well as the metaphysical systems of the Muslim philosophers (falasifa), notably al-Farabi, and Ibn Sina (Avicenna) who was his contemporary. In his Kitab al-riyad, al-Kirmani acted as an arbiter in a philosophical debate that had taken place earlier among some Iranian da‘is, notably Muhammad al-Nasafi, Abu YaRahat al-‘aql, which is written for the advanced adepts. In this book, al-Kirmani also propounded what may be regarded as the third stage in the development of Ismaili cosmology in medieval times. Al-Kirmani replaced the Neoplatonic dyad of the Intellect (‘aql) and Soul (nafs) in the spiritual world, which had been adopted by his Iranian Ismaili predecessors, by a series of ten separate Intellects in partial adaptation of al-Farabi’s Aristotelian cosmic system. Al-Kirmani’s cosmology, representing an original synthesis of different philosophical traditions, was not however adopted by the Fatimid Ismailis; it later provided the basis for the development of the fourth and final stage of Ismaili cosmology at the hands of the Musta‘li-Tayyibi scholars in Yaman.

References and Further Reading

  • W. Ivanow, Ismaili Literature: A Bibliographical Survey, Tehran, 1963, pp. 40-45. Contains a survey of al-Kirmani’s known works and their manuscripts, preserved mainly in Yaman and India.
  • I. K. Poonawala, Biobibliography of Ismaili Literature Malibu, Calif., 1977, pp. 94-102. Also contains a survey of al-Kirmani’s known works and their manuscripts, preserved mainly in Yaman and India.
  • J. van Ess, “Bibliographische Notizen zur islamischen Theologie. I. Zur Chronologie der Werke des Hamidaddin al-Kirmani”, Die Welt des Orients, 9, 1978, pp. 255-261. A partial chronology of al-Kirmani’s works.
  • W. Madelung, “Das Imamat in der frühen ismailitischen Lehre”, Der Islam, 37, 1961, pp. 114-127.
  • H. Corbin, Cyclical Time and Ismaili Gnosis, London, 1983, index.
  • F. Daftary, The Ismailis: Their History and Doctrines, Cambridge, 1990, pp. 113, 192-193, 196-197, 218, 227, 229-230, 235-236, 240, 245-246, 287, 291, 298.
  • Paul E. Walker, Early Philosophical Shiism, Cambridge, 1993, index.
  • Paul. E. Walker, Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani: Ismaili Thought in the Age of al-Hakim, London, 1999.
  • Daniel De Smet, La Quiétude de l’intellect: Néoplatonisme et gnose ismaélienne dans l’oeuvre de Hamid ad-Din al-Kirmani, Louvain, 1995.

Author Information

Farhad Daftary
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Al-Shahrastānī (d. 1153 C.E.)

Al-Shahrastānī (d. A.H. 548 / C.E. 1153) was an influential historian of religions and a heresiographer. He was one of the pioneers in developing a scientific approach to the study of religions. Al-Shahrastānī' distinguished himself by his desire to describe in the most objective way the universal religious history of humanity. He was wrongly recognized as an "Ash‘arite" theologian; this is why some scholars such as Muhammad Ridā Jalālī Nā’īnī, Muhammad Taqī Dānish-Pazhūh, Wilferd Madelung, Jean Jolivet, and Guy Monnot firmly believe that he was an Ismā‘īlī who was practicing taqiyya (religious dissimulation) since Ismā‘īlis were persecuted during that time. Very few things are known about al-Shahrastānī's life. He was born in A.H. 479/ C.E. 1086 in the town of Shahristān (Republic of Turkmenistan) where he acquired his early traditional education. Later, he was sent to Nīshāpūr where he studied under different masters who were all disciples of the Ash‘arite theologian al-Juwaynī (d. A.H. 478 / C.E. 1085). At the age of 30, al-Shahrastānī went to Baghdad to pursue theological studies and taught for three years at the prestigious Ash‘arite school, the Nizāmiyya. Afterwards, he returned to Persia where he worked as Nā’ib (Deputy) of the chancellery for Sanjar, the Saljūq ruler of Khurāsān. At the end of his life, al-Shahrastānī went back to live in his native town.

Table of Contents

  1. The Man and His Works
  2. His Intricate Theosophy
  3. References and Further Reading

1. The Man and His Works

During the 'Abbasid Caliphate (A.H. 132/ C.E. 750 - A.H. 656/ C.E. 1258), the golden age of Islamic literature, many schools elaborated their major works of medieval Islamic thought. Shi‘ism has particularly influenced the destiny of Islam in the political and, even more so, the philosophical domain. Isma‘ilism belongs to the Shi‘ite mainstream of Islam. From the beginning, Islam was divided mainly into two groups: the Sunnites and the Shi‘ites. The Sunnites believe that Prophet Muhammad did not explicitly name a Successor after his death. The Shi‘ites affirm, on the contrary, that Muhammad explicitly designated ‘Ali as the first Imam (divine Guide) and his direct descendants as successors. According to Muslim tenets, Muhammad was the last Prophet, the one who closed the Prophetic cycle. The Shi‘ites maintain that humanity still needs a spiritual Guide, therefore the cycle of Prophecy must be succeeded by the cycle of Imama. The prerogative of the Imam is to give the right interpretation of the Qur'an and to gradually reveal its esoteric meaning.

Al-Shahrastani was certainly not an Ash'arite theologian, as has often been argued, even if he borrows some basic concepts shared commonly by various Muslim thinkers. Al-Shahrastani is a difficult person to evaluate because he juggled many different philosophical and theological vocabularies. He was a clever thinker, demonstrated by the intricacies of many traditions and the Shi‘ite notion of the Guide found in his thoughts. Al-Shahrastani had many reasons to speak somewhat allegorically. He was a very subtle author who often spoke indirectly by means of symbols. He preferred his own personal vocabulary to the traditional one. For this reason, his position is hard to determine. It may well be that ideological considerations led him to speak indirectly; he perhaps assumed those familiar with the symbols would be able to unravel his elusive ideas. For all these reasons, many scholars who have studied al-Shahrastani were misled concerning his religious identity. (For an extensive discussion of al-Shahrastānī's identity as Ash‘arite or Ismā‘īlī, cf. Steigerwald, 1997: 298-307.)

The richness and originality of al-Shahrastani's philosophical and theological thought is manifested in his major works. The Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal (The Book of Sects and Creeds), a monumental work, presents the doctrinal points of view of all the religions and philosophies which existed up to his time. The Nihayat al-aqdam fi 'ilm al-kalam (The End of Steps in the Science of Theology) presents different theological discussions and shows the limits of Muslim theology (kalam). The Majlis is a discourse, written during the mature period of his life, delivered to a Twelver Shi‘ite audience. The Musara‘at al-Falasifa (The Struggle with Philosophers) criticizes Avicenna’s doctrines by emphasizing some peculiar Isma‘ili arguments on the division of beings. The Mafatih al-Asrar wa-masabih al-abrar (The Keys of the Mysteries and the Lamps of the Righteous) introduces the Qur’an and gives a complete commentary of the first two chapters of the Qur’an.

2. His Intricate Theosophy

As opposed to Ash'arites, al-Shahrastani presents a gradation in the creation (khalq). He gives a definition of the Prophetic Impeccability (‘Isma) opposed to the Ash‘arite tradition, maintaining that it subsists in the Prophet as part of his real nature. As did al-Ghazzali, al-Shahrastani harshly criticizes Avicenna's Necessary Being who knows the universal but not the particular. Al-Shahrastani, particularly in the Musara‘a al-Falasifa, has an Isma‘ili conception of the Originator (Mubdi‘) beyond Being and non-Being. He argues convincingly for the existence of Divine Attributes, but he does not ascribe them directly to God. True worship means Tawhid - declaring the Unicity of God. This includes the negation of all attributes which humans give to God, the Ultimate One who is totally transcendent. God is Unknowable, Indefinable, Unattainable, and above human comprehension.

As for the theory of creation, in the Nihaya, al-Shahrastani insists that God is the only Creator and the only Agent. He also develops a different interpretation of ex-nihilo creation which does not mean creation out of nothing, but creation made only by God. (al-Shahrastani, 1934: 18-9) But in the Majlis and the Mafatih al-Asrar, the angels play a dominant role in the physical creation. (al-Shahrastani, 1998: 82; 1989, vol. I: 109 verso line 24 to 110 recto line 1) His theory of the Divine Word (Kalima) has a convincing Isma'ili imprint; for example, his hierarchy of angels and Divine Words (Kalimat ) are conceived as being the causes of spiritual beings. Al-Shahrastani in the Nihaya writes:

"that his [Divine] Command (Amr) is pre-existent and his multiple Kalimat are eternal. By his Command, Kalimat become the manifestation of it. Spiritual beings are the manifestation of Kalimat and bodies are the manifestation of spiritual beings. The Ibda' (Origination beyond time and space) and khalq (physical creation) become manifested [respectively in] spiritual beings and bodies. As for Kalimat and letters (huruf), they are eternal and pre-existent. Since his Command is not similar to our command, his Kalimat and his letters are not similar to our Kalimat . Since letters are elements of Kalimat which are the causes of spiritual beings who govern corporeal beings; all existence subsists in the Kalimat Allah preserved in his Command." (al-Shahrastani, 1934: 316)

In the Majlis, al-Shahrastani divides the creation into two worlds: the spiritual world (i.e. the world of the Origination of spirits (Ibda'-i arwah)) in an achieved (mafrugh) state) and the world of physical creation (khalq) in becoming (musta'naf). He shares an Isma‘ili cosmology in which God has built his religion in the image of creation.

The conception of Prophecy developed in the Nihaya is closer to that of Isma'ilis and Falasifa (Islamic philosophers) than to Ash‘arites, because al-Shahrastani establishes a logical link between miracles and Prophetic Impeccability (‘Isma). For al-Shahrastani, the proof of veracity (sidq) of the Prophet is intrinsic to his nature and is related to his Impeccability. (Al-Shahrastani, 1934: 444-5) He develops the concept of cyclical time explicitly in the Milal, the Majlis, and the Mafatih and implicitly in the Nihaya. In the Majlis, his understanding of the dynamic evolution of humanity is similar to Isma‘ilism, in which each Prophet opens a new cycle. Al-Shahrastani recovers the mythical Qur'anic story of Moses and the Servant of God inspired by Al-Risala al-Mudhhiba of al-qadi al-Nu‘man (d. A.H. 363 / C.E. 974).

Al-Shahrastani was an able and learned man of great personal charm. The real nature of his thought is best referred to by the term theosophy, in the older sense of "divine wisdom". However, al-Shahrastani was certainly not totally against theology or philosophy, even if he was very harsh against the theologians and the philosophers. As he explained in the Majlis, in order to remain on the right path, one must preserve a perfect equilibrium between intellect ('aql) and audition (sam‘). A philosopher or a theologian must use his intellect until he reaches the rational limit. Beyond this limit, he must listen to the teaching of Prophets and Imams.

His works reflect a complex interweaving of intellectual strands, and his thought is a synthesis of this fruitful historical period. In his conception of God, Creation, Prophecy, and Imama, al Shahrastani adopted many doctrinal elements that are reconcilable with Nizari Isma'ilism. The necessity of a Guide, belonging both to the spiritual and the physical world, is primordial in his scheme since the Imam is manifested in this physical world.

3. References and Further Reading

  • Danish-Pazhuh, Muhammad Taqi
  • 1346HS/1968 "Da'i al-du‘at Taj al-din-i Shahrastana." Nama-yi astan-i quds 7: 77-80
  • 1347HS/1969 "Da'i al-du‘at Taj al-din-i Shahrastana." Nama-yi astan-i quds 8: 61-71.
  • Gimaret, Daniel, Monnot, Guy and Jolivet, Jean
  • 1986-1993 Livre des religions et des sectes. 2 vols. Belgium (Peeters): UNESCO.
  • Jolivet, Jean
  • 2000 "AL-SHAHRASTÂNÎ critique d'Avicenne Dans la Lutte contre les philosophes (quelques aspects)," Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 10: 275-292.
  • Madelung, Wilferd
  • 1976 "Ash-Shahrastanis Streitschrift gegen Avicenna und ihre Widerlegung durch Nasir ad-din at.-Tusi." Akten des VII. Kongresses für Arabistik und Islamwissenschaft, Abhandlungen der Akademie des Wissenschaften in Göttingen 98: 250-9.
  • Monnot, Guy
  • 1983-84 "Islam: exégèse coranique." Annuaire de l'École Pratique des Hautes Études 92: 305-15.
  • 1986-1987 "Islam: exégèse coranique." Annuaire de l'École Pratique des Hautes Études 95: 253-59.
  • 1987-1988 "Islam: exégèse coranique." Annuaire de l'École Pratique des Hautes Études 96: 237-43.
  • 1996 "Shahrastani." Encyclopédie de l'islam 9: 220-22.
  • 1999 Book review of La pensée philosophique et théologique de Shahrastani (m. 548/1153) by Diane Steigerwald in Bulletin critique des annales islamologiques 15: 79-81.
  • 2001 Book review of Majlis-i maktub-i Shahrastani-i mun'aqid dar Khwarazm. Ed. Muhammad Rida R. Jalali Na'ini and translated into French by Diane Steigerwald in Majlis: Discours sur l’ordre et la création. Sainte-Foy (Québec): Les Presses de l’Université Laval in Bulletin critique des annales islamologiques 17.
  • Na'ini, Jalali
  • 1343HS/1964 Sharh-i Hal wa Athar-i Hujjat al-Haqq Abu al-Fath Muhammad b. 'Abd al-Karim b. Ahmad Shahrastani. Tehran.
  • al-Nu'man, Abu Hanifa
  • 1956 Al-Risala al-Mudhhiba. In Khams Rasa'il Isma'iliyya. Ed. ‘Arif Tamir, Beirut.
  • Al-Shahrastani, Abu al-Fath Ibn 'Abd al-Karim
  • 1850 Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal. Trans. Theodor Haarbrücker in Religionspartheien und Philosophen-Schulen. Vol. 1 Halles.
  • 1923 Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal. Ed. William Cureton in Books of Religions and Philosophical Sects. 2 vols. Leipzig: Otto Harrassowitz (reprint of the edition of London 1846).
  • 1934 Nihayat al-Aqdam fi 'Ilm al-Kalam. Ed. and partially trans. Alfred Guillaume in The Summa Philosophiae of Shahrastani. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1366-1375/1947-1955 Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal. Ed. Muhammad Fath Allah Badran, 2 vols. Cairo.
  • 1396/1976 Musara'at al-Falasifa. Ed. Suhayr M. Mukhtar. Cairo.
  • 1989 Mafatih al-Asrar wa-masabih al-abrar. Tehran.
  • 1998 Majlis-i maktub-i Shahrastani-i mun'aqid dar Khwarazm. Ed. Muhammad Rida R. Jalali Na'ini and translated into French by Diane Steigerwald in Majlis: Discours sur l’ordre et la création. Sainte-Foy (Québec): Les Presses de l’Université Laval.
  • 2001 Musara'at al-Falasifa. Ed. and translated by Wilferd Madelung and Toby Mayer in Struggling with the Philosopher: A Refutation of Avicenna's Metaphysics. London: I.B. Tauris.
  • Steigerwald, Diana
  • 1995 "L'Ordre (Amr) et la création (khalq) chez Shahrastani." Folia Orientalia 31: 163-75.
  • 1996 "The Divine Word (Kalima) in Shahrastani's Majlis." Studies in Religion/Sciences religieuses 25.3: 335-52.
  • 1997 La pensée philosophique et théologique de Shahrastani (m. 548/1153). Sainte-Foy (Québec): Les Presses de l'Université Laval.
  • 1998 "La dissimulation (taqiyya) de la foi dans le shi'isme ismaélien." Studies in Religion/Sciences religieusesz, 27.1: 39-59.
  • 2001 Book review of al-Shahrastani, Kitab al-Musâra'at al-Falasifa (Struggling with the Philosopher: A Refutation of Avicenna's Metaphysics), edited and translated by Wilferd Madelung and Toby Mayer, London, Tauris, 2001 in Studies in Religion/Sciences religieuses 30.2: 233-234.
  • 2004 "The Contribution of al-Shahrastani to Islamic Medieval Thought." In Reason and Inspiration: Islamic Studies in Honor of Hermann A. Landolt. London: I.B. Tauris, (forthcoming).

Author Information

Diana Steigerwald
California State University Long Beach
U. S. A.

Abu Ya'qub al-Sijistani (fl. 971)

Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani was first and foremost a member of the Ismaili underground mission — the da‘wa, as it is known in Arabic — that operated in the Iranian province of Khurasan and Sijistan during the tenth century. In the later part of his life, al-Sijistani was or had become a supporter of the Fatimids imams, then ruling from their headquarters far away in North Africa.Al-Sijistani was deeply inspired by Neoplanotism. His cosmology and metaphysics develop a concept of God as the one beyond both being and non-being. God is not a substance, not intellect, nor within the categories that pertain to the created universe in any way. Intellect is the first existent being, originated by God as an indivisible whole.

In contrast to many other Islamic philosophers, al-Sijistani insists that intellect does not divide or separate. The intellect remains a whole and is universal. Only one intellect engenders by procession the soul. The soul falls therefore on its higher side within the lower horizon of intellect whereas its own lower aspect is nature, a semi-hypostatic being between the spiritual and the physical realm. The goal of religion and prophecy is to reorient the soul toward its true higher self and ultimately to return to its original state.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Neoplatonism
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani was first and foremost a member of the Ismaili underground mission — the da‘wa, as it is known in Arabic — that operated in the Iranian province of Khurasan and Sijistan during the tenth century. His activities and the works he wrote must be seen in that context; he was a partisan of a specific religious and political cause that involved the restoration of Shi‘ism as the dominant force in the Islamic world of the time. In addition al-Sijistani was an important advocate of philosophical doctrines that drew heavily on a current of Neoplatonism then circulating in intellectual circles of various kinds in the major centers of Islamic scholarship. For the latter reason in general and for his clear attachment in his philosophical writings to a fairly pure form of this branch of ancient thought, he earned an important place in the history of philosophy, even though he himself would have insisted that he was not a philosopher.

Although he is mentioned both in Ismaili and non-Ismaili sources, the amount of information about his life that survives is scarcely adequate. Two important details emerge from one of his late works: he was in Baghdad in the year 934 having just then returned from the pilgrimage to Mecca, and in about 971 or 972 he composed that treatise itself. Somewhat later he died a martyr. The one additional fact about him is a nickname, 'Cotton-seed,' recorded by several observers both in its Arabic and its Persian forms. By the time he wrote (or revised) those works of his that are now extant, al-Sijistani was or had become a supporter of the Fatimids imams, then ruling from their headquarters far away in North Africa. Hints in his own works and other information suggests, however, that he may have earlier belonged to a dissident wing of the Ismaili movement, as was the case with at least two of his philosophical predecessors in Iran. Accordingly, the works he wrote prior to his acceptance of the Fatimids as imams, would have been considered doctrinally false and they, unless revised, were abandoned and thus did not survive.

2. Neoplatonism

Those now available are certainly not all complete and one exists solely in a later Persian paraphrase of its original (lost) Arabic. Critical editions and translations are few in number. Moreover, the philosophical content in some works far exceeds that of others. It was al-Sijistani's custom to assemble his material in a series of, often disconnected, topical chapters and to mix Ismaili doctrinal teachings with philosophy in alternating, but most often not overlapping, short sections. Therefore, his Neoplatonism frequently appears in what he wrote separated — although not always — from his more specifically religious concerns. Thus his philosophical position becomes apparent only in portions of his works, in particular certain chapters of his The Wellsprings, The Keys, Prophecy’s Proof, and Revealing the Concealed. On these titles, their general contents, and the state of modern studies of them, see Paul E. Walker, Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani: Intellectual Missionary (London, 1998) especially the appendix.

The Neoplatonic background to al-Sijistani's thought is fairly complex. Beginning as early as the middle of the preceding century several important texts, or portions of them, were translated from Greek into Arabic, including the widely circulated Theologia, sometimes called the Theology of Aristotle. Others were a longer version of this same Theologia, the Liber de causis, and a doxographical work that goes by the name of the Pseudo-Ammonius. The Theologia contains for the most part passages from Plotinus’s Enneads IV to VI; the Liber de causis depends ultimately on Proclus’s Element of Theology. All of these texts and others were available to the Ismaili philosophers —and other Islamic thinkers — by the beginning of the tenth century. The Islamic world had time by then to digest this material thoroughly and to begin an elaboration of various specific doctrines expressed in it. From his position a generation or so later, al-Sijistani came to Neoplatonism as much from within a nascent Islamic tradition of it as of his own raw confrontation with specific individual Greek (or pseudo-Greek) texts, which his own writings reflect therefore only secondarily.

Nevertheless, the major Neoplatonic influences in the thought of al-Sijistani comprise a cosmology and metaphysics that adhere closely to important doctrines of Plotinus, among them an austerely rigorous concept of God as the one beyond both being and non-being. God is not a substance, not intellect, nor within the categories that pertain to the created universe in any way. Intellect is the first existent being, originated by God as an indivisible whole. It is the source of all else that exists. In contrast to many other Islamic philosophers, al-Sijistani adamantly insists that intellect does not divide or separate. There is only one intellect. It does, however, engender by procession the soul and the latter again remains a whole and is a universal. It does, even so, descend in parts into individual creatures who are thus animated by it. The soul falls therefore on its higher side within the lower horizon of intellect whereas its own lower aspect is nature, a semi-hypostatic being at the point of transition from the spiritual into the physical realm. The goal of religion and of prophecy is to reorient the soul toward its true unblemished higher self and ultimately to have it regain its original sublime existence.

Although the outline of standard Neoplatonic ideas can be observed in al-Sijistani's thought, there are curiosities that do not seem to belong. One is his doctrine that God creates by willful fiat — that is, by issuing a command to be. Another involves the notion that salvation — the restoration in the soul of its spirituality — is a historical development that runs upward step by step following the course of the cycles of prophetic revelations and the religious laws that each lawgiving-prophet establishes in turn.

3. References and Further Reading

  • H. Corbin, Trilogie ismaélienne (Tehran and Paris, 1961)
  • H. Corbin, ed., Kashf al-mahjub (Revealing the Concealed) (Tehran and Paris, 1949), French trans. Corbin, Le dévoilement des choses caches (Paris, 1988).
  • P. Walker, Early Philosophical Shiism: The Ismaili Neoplatonism of Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani (Cambridge, 1993).
  • P. Walker, The Wellsprings of Wisdom: A study of Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani's Kitab al-yanabi‘ (Salt Lake City, 1994).

Author Information

Paul E. Walker
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Nasir al-Din Tusi (1201—1274)

Nasir al-Din Tusi, by far the most celebrated scholar of the 13th century Islamic lands, was born in Tus, in 1201 and died in Baghdad in 1274. He was apparently born into a Twelver Shi‘i family. At the age of twenty-two or a while later, Tusi joined the court of Nasir al-Din Muhtashim, the Ismaili governor of Quhistan, Northeast Iran, where he was accepted into the Ismaili community as a novice.Around 634/1236, we find Tusi in Alamut, the centre of Nizari Ismaili government. He seems to have climbed the ranks of the Ismaili da‘wat ascending to the position of chief missionary (da‘i al-du‘at). The collapse of Ismaili political power and the massacre of the Ismaili population, during the Mongol invasion, left no choice for Tusi except the exhibition of some sort of affiliation to Twelver Shi‘ism and denouncing his Ismaili allegiances (taqiyya).

In the Mongol court, Tusi witnessed the fall of the ‘Abbasid caliphate and after a while, securing the trust of Hulegu, the Mongol chief, he was given the full authority of administering the finances of religious foundations (awqaf). The ensemble of Tusi’s writings amounts to approximately 165 titles on a wide variety of subjects (astronomy, ethics, history, jurisprudence, logic, mathematics, medicine, philosophy, theology, poetry and the popular sciences).

Nasir al-Din Tusi, Muhammad b. Muhammad b. Hasan, by far the most celebrated scholar of the 7th/13th century Islamic lands was born in Tus, in 597/1201 and died in Baghdad on 18 Dhu’l Hijja 672/25 June, 1274. Thomas Aquinas and Roger Bacon were his contemporaries in the West. Very little is known about his childhood and early education, apart from what he writes in his autobiography, Contemplation and Action (Sayr wa suluk).

He was apparently born into a Twelver Shi‘i family and lost his father at a young age. Fulfilling the wish of his father, the young Muhammad took learning and scholarship very seriously and travelled far and wide to attend the lectures of renowned scholars and ‘acquire the knowledge which guides people to the happiness of the next world.’ As a young boy, Tusi studied mathematics with Kamal al-Diin Hasib about whom we have no authentic knowledge. In Nishabur he met Farid al-Din ‘Attar, the legendary Sufi master who was later killed in the hand of Mongol invaders and attended the lectures of Qutb al-Din Misri and Farid al-Din Damad. In Mawsil he studied mathematics and astronomy with Kamal al-Din Yunus (d. 639/1242). Later on he corresponded with Qaysari, the son-in-law of Ibn al-‘Arabi, and it seems that mysticism, as propagated by Sufi masters of his time, was not appealing to his mind and once the occasion was suitable, he composed his own manual of philosophical Sufism in the form of a small booklet entitled The Attributes of the Illustrious (Awsaf al-ashraf).

His ability and talent in learning enabled Tusi to master a number disciplines in a relatively short period. At the time when educational priorities leaned towards the religious sciences, especially in his own family who were associated with the Twelver Shi‘i clergy, Tusi seems to have shown great interest for mathematics, astronomy and the intellectual sciences. At the age of twenty-two or a while later, Tusi joined the court of Nasir al-Din Muhtashim, the Ismaili governor of Quhistan, Northeast Iran, where he was accepted into the Ismaili community as a novice (mustajib). A sign of close personal relationship with Muhtashim’s family is to be seen in the dedication of a number of his scholarly works such as Akhlaq-i Nasiri and Akhlaq-i Muhtashimi to Nasir al-Din himself and Risala-yi Mu‘iniyya to his son Mu‘in al-Din.

Around 634/1236, we find Tusi in Alamut, the centre of Nizari Ismaili government. The scholarly achievements of Tusi in the compilation of Akhlaq-i Nasiri in 633/1235, seems to, amongst other factors, have paved the way for this move which was a great honour and opportunity for a scholar of his calibre, especially since Alamut was the seat of the Ismaili imam and housed the most important library in the Ismaili state.

In Alamut, apart from teaching, editing, dictating and compiling scholarly works, Tusi seems to have climbed the ranks of the Ismaili da‘wat ascending to the position of chief missionary (da‘i al-du‘at). Through constant visits with scholars and tireless correspondences, a practice which he developed from a very young age, Tusi kept his contact with the academic world outside Ismaili circles and was addressed as ‘the scholar’ (al-muhaqiq) from a very early period in his life.

The Mongol invasion and the turmoil they caused in the eastern Islamic territories hardly left the life of any of its citizens untouched. The collapse of Ismaili political power and the massacre of the Ismaili population, who were a serious threat to the Mongols, left no choice for Tusi except the exhibition of some sort of affiliation to Twelver Shi‘ism and denouncing his Ismaili allegiances.

Although under Mongol domination, Tusi’s allegiance to any particular community or persuasion could not have been of any particular importance, the process itself paved the ground for Tusi to write on various aspects of Shi‘ism, both from Ismaili and Twelver Shi‘i viewpoints, with scholarly vigour and enthusiasm. The most famous of his Ismaili compilations are Rawda-yi taslim, Sayr wa suluk, Tawalla wa tabarra, Akhlaq-i Muhtashimi and Matlub al-mu’minin. Tajrid al-i‘tiqad, al-Risala fi’l-imama and Fusul-i Nasiriyya are among his works dedicated to Twelver Shi‘ism.

In the Mongol court, Tusi witnessed the fall of the ‘Abbasid caliphate and after a while, securing the trust of Hulegu, the Mongol chief, he was given the full authority of administering the finances of religious foundations (awqaf). During this period of his life, Tusi’s main concern was combating Mongol savagery, saving the life of innocent scholars and the establishment of one of the most important centres of learning in Maragha, Northwest Iran. The compilation of Musari‘at al-musari;, the Awsaf al-ashraf and Talkis al-muhassal are the scholarly writings of Tusi in the final years of his life.

The ensemble of Tusi’s writings amounts to approximately 165 titles on a wide variety of subjects. Some of them are simply a page or even half a page, but the majority with few exceptions, are well prepared scholarly works on astronomy, ethics, history, jurisprudence, logic, mathematics, medicine, philosophy, theology, poetry and the popular sciences. Tusi’s fame in his own lifetime guaranteed the survival of almost all of his scholarly output. The adverse effect of his fame is also the attribution of a number of works which neither match his style nor has the quality of his writings.

Tusi’s major works: (1) Astronomy: al-Tadhkira fi ‘ilm al-hay’a; Zij Ilkhani; Risala-yi Mu‘iniyya and its commentary. (2) Ethics: Gushayish-nama; Akhlaq-i Muhtashami; Akhlaq-i Nasiri, ‘Deliberation 22’ in Rawda-yi taslim and a Persian translation of Ibn Muqaffa‘’s al-Adab al-wajiz. (3) History: Fath-i Baghdad which appears as an appendix to Tarikh-i Jahan-gushay of Juwayni (London, 1912-27), vol. 3, pp. 280-92. (4) Jurisprudence: Jawahir al-fara’id. (5) Logic: Asas al-iqtibas. (6) Mathematics: Revision of Ptolemy’s Almagest; the epistles of Theodosius, Hypsicles, Autolucus, Aristarchus, Archimedes, Menelaus, Thabit b. Qurra and Banu Musa. (7) Medicine: Ta‘liqa bar qunun-i Ibn Sina and his correspondences with Qutb al-Din Shirazi and Katiban Qazwini. (8) Philosophy: refutation of al-Shahrastani in Musara‘at al-musari‘; his commentary on Ibn Sina’s al-Isharat wa’l-tanbihat which took him almost 20 years to complete; his autobiography Sayr wa suluk; Rawda-yi taslim and Tawalla wa tabarra. (9) Theology: Aghaz wa anjam; Risala fi al-imama and Talkhis al-muhassal and (10) Poetry: Mi‘yar al-ash‘ar.

References and Further Reading

  • Badakhchani, S. J. Contemplation and Action: The Spiritual Autobiography of a Muslim Scholar (London, I. B. Tauris in association with The Institute of Ismaili Studies, 1998).
  • Mudarris Radawi, Muhammad. Ahwal wa athar-i Abu Ja‘far Muhammad b. Muhammad b. Hasan al-Tusi. Tehran, Intisharat-i Danishgah-i Tehran, 1345s/1975.
  • Mudarrisi Zanjani, Muhammad. Sargudhasht wa ‘aqa‘id-i falsafi-yi Khwaja Nasir al-Din Tusi. Tehran, Intisharat-i Danishgah-i Tehran, 1363s/1984.
  • Madelung, Wilferd. ‘Nasir al-Din Tusi’s Ethics Between Philosophy, Shi‘ism and Sufism,’ in Ethics in Islam, ed. R. G. Hovannisian, Malibu, CA, 1985, pp. 85-101.

Author Information

S. J. Badakhchani
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom