Category Archives: Philosophical Traditions

Gabriel Marcel (1889—1973)

The philosophical approach known as existentialism is commonly recognized for its view that life’s experiences and interactions are meaningless.  Many existentialist thinkers are led to conclude that life is only something to be tolerated, and that close or intimate relationships with others should be avoided. Heard distinctly among this despair and dread was the original philosophical voice of Gabriel Marcel.  Marcel, a World War I non-combatant veteran, pursued the life of an intellectual, and enjoyed success as a playwright, literary critic, and concert pianist.  He was trained in philosophy by Henri Bergson, among others.  A prolific life-long writer, his early works reflected his interest in idealism.  As Marcel developed philosophically, however, his work was marked by an emphasis on the concrete, on lived experience.  After converting to Catholicism in 1929, he became a noted opponent of atheistic existentialism, and primarily that of Jean-Paul Sartre.  Sartre’s characterizations of the isolated self, the death of God, and lived experience as having “no exit” especially disgusted Marcel.  Regardless of his point of departure, Marcel throughout his life balked at the designation of his philosophy as, “Theistic existentialism.”  He argued that, though theism was consistent with his existentialism, it was not an essential characteristic of it.

Marcel’s conception of freedom is the most philosophically enduring of all of his themes, although the last decade has seen a resurgence of attention paid to Marcel’s metaphysics and epistemology.  A decidedly unsystematic thinker, it is difficult to categorize Marcel’s work, in large part because the main Marcelian themes are so interconnected.  A close read, however, shows that in addition to that of freedom, Marcel’s important philosophical contributions were on the themes of participation, creative fidelity, exigence, and presence.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Freedom
  3. Participation
  4. Creative Fidelity
  5. Exigence
  6. Presence
  7. Hope and the Existential Self
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gabriel Marcel was born in Paris in 1889, the city where he also died in 1973.  Marcel was the only child of Henri and Laure Marcel.  His father was a French diplomat to Sweden and was committed to educating his son through frequent travel across Europe.  The death of his mother, in 1893 when Gabriel was not quite four years old left an indelible impression on him.  He was raised primarily by his mother’s sister, whom his father married two years after Laure’s passing, and though “Auntie” loved her nephew and gave him the best formal education, Gabriel loathed the structure of the classroom, and became excited about the intellectual life only after entering Sorbonne, from which he graduated in 1910.

Marcel was not a “dogmatic pacifist,” but experiences in World War I as a non-combatant solidified to Marcel the, “Desolate aspect that it [war] became an object of indignation, a horror without equal,” (AE 20) and contributed to a life-long fascination with death.  It was during the war that many of the important philosophical themes in Marcel’s later work would take root, and indeed, during the war, Marcel began writing in a journal that served as a framework for his first book, Metaphysical Journal (1927).

After the war, Marcel married Jaqueline Boegner, and he taught at a secondary school in Paris.  It was in these early wedded years that Marcel became engaged as a playwright, philosopher, and literary critic.  The couple continued to travel, they adopted a son, Jean Marie, and Marcel developed friendships with important thinkers of the day.  Marcel gave talks throughout Europe as a result of these contacts, and was regarded as a keen mind and a type of renaissance figure, excelling in music, drama, philosophy, theology, and politics.  As for his literary works, Marcel in total published more than 30 plays, a number of which have been translated in English and produced in the United States.  Marcel was acutely aware, however, that his dramatic work did not enjoy the popularity of his philosophical work, but he believed nonetheless that both were, “Capable of moving and often of absorbing readers very different from one another, living in the most diverse countries—beings whom it is not a question of counting precisely because they are human beings and belong as such to an order where number loses all meaning,” (AE, 27).

Although Marcel did not pursue anything more permanent than intermittent teaching posts at secondary schools, he did hold prestigious lectureships, giving the Gifford Lectures at Aberdeen in 1949-50 and the William James Lectures at Harvard in 1961.  His most significant philosophical works include Being and Having (1949), The Mystery of Being, Volume I and II (1950-51), Man against Mass Society (1962) and Creative Fidelity (1964). During his latter years, he emerged as a vocal political thinker, and played a crucial role in organizing and advocating the international Moral Re-Armament movement of the 1960s.  (Marcel was pleased to be awarded the Peace Prize of the Börsenverein des Buchhandels in 1964.)

Throughout his life, Marcel sought out, and was sought out by, various influential thinkers, including Paul Ricoeur, Jacques Maritain, Charles Du Bos, Gustave Thibon, and Emmanuel Levinas.  In spite of the many whom he positively influenced, Marcel became known for his very public disagreements with Jean-Paul Sartre.  In fact, the acrimony between the two became such that the two would attend performances of the other’s plays, only to storm out midway.  Perhaps the most fundamental ideological disagreement between the two was over the notion of autonomy.  For Marcel, autonomy is a discovery of the self as a being receptive to others, rather than as a power to be exerted.  Marcel’s autonomy is rooted in a commitment to participation with others (see 3 below), and is unique in that the participative subject is committed by being encountered, or approached by, another individual’s need.  Sartre’s notion of commitment is based on the strength of the solitary decisions made by individuals who have committed themselves fully to personal independence.  Yet, Marcel took commitment to be primarily the response to the appeal directed to the self as an individual (A 179) so that the self is free to respond to another on account of their mutual needs.  The feud between the two, though heated, had the effect of casting a shadow over Marcel’s work as “mysticism” rather than philosophy, a stigma that Marcel would work for the rest of his life to dispute.

2. Freedom

A strange inner mutation is spreading throughout humanity, according to Marcel.  As odd as it first seems, this mutation is evoked by the awareness that members of humanity are contingent on conditions which make up the framework for their very existence.  Man recognizes that at root, he is an existing thing, but he somehow feels compelled to prove his life is more significant than that.  He begins to believe that the things he surrounds himself with can make his life more meaningful or valuable.  This belief, says Marcel, has thrown man into a ghostly state of quandary caused by a desire to possess rather than to be.  All people become a master of defining their individual selves by either their possessions or by their professions.  Meaning is forced into life through these venues.  Even more, individuals begin to believe that their lives have worth because they are tied to these things, these objects.  This devolution creates a situation in which individuals experience the self only as a statement, as an object, “I am x.”

The objectification of the self through one’s possessions robs one of her freedom, and separates her from the experiences of her own participation in being.  The idolatrous world of perverted possession must be abandoned if the true reality of humanity is to be reached (SZ 285).  Perhaps most known for his views on freedom, Marcel gave to existentialism a view of freedom that marries the absolute indeterminacy of traditional existentialism with Marcel’s view that transcendence out of facticity can only come by depending upon others with the same goals.  The result is a type of freedom-by-degrees in which all people are free, since to be free is to be self-governing, but not all people experience freedom that can lead them out of objectification.  The experience of freedom cannot be achieved unless the subject extricates herself from the grip of egocentrism, since freedom is not simply doing what desire dictates.  The person who sees herself as autonomous within herself  has a freedom based on ill-fated egocentrism.  She errs in believing freedom to be rooted on independence.

Freedom is defined by Marcel in both a negative and positive sense.  Negatively, freedom is, “The absence of whatever resembles an alienation from oneself,” and positively as when, “The motives of my action are within the limits of what I can legitimately consider as the structural traits of my self,” (TF, 232).  Freedom, then, is always about the possibilities of the self, understood within the confines of relationships with others.  As an existentialist, Marcel’s freedom is tied to the raw experiences of the body.  However, the phenomenology of Marcelian freedom  is characterized by his insistence that freedom is something to be experienced, and the self is fully free when it is submerged in the possibilities of the self and the needs of others.  Although all humans have basic, autonomous freedom (Marcel thought of this as “capricious” freedom), in virtue of their embodiment and consciousness; only those persons who seek to experience being by freely engaging with other free beings can break out of the facticity of the body and into the fulfillment of being.  The free act is significant because it contributes to defining the self, “By freedom I am given back to myself,” (VII vii).

At first glance, Marcelian freedom is paradoxical:  the more one enters into a self-centered project, the less legitimate it is to say that the act is free, whereas the more the self is engaged with other free individuals, the more the self is free.  However, the phenomenological experience of freedom is less paradoxical when it is seen through the lens of the engagement of freedom.  Ontologically, we rarely have experiences of the singular self; instead, our experiences are bound to those with whom we interact.  Freedom based on the very participation that the free act seeks to affirm is the ground of the true experience of freedom towards which Marcel gravitates.

3. Participation

Marcel was an early proponent of what would become a major Sartrean existential tenet:  I am my body.  For Marcel, the body does not have instrumental value, nor is it simply a part or extension of the self.  Instead, the self cannot be eradicated from the body.  It is impossible for the self to conceive of the body in any way at all except for as a distinct entity identified with the self (CF 23).  Existence is prior, and existence is prior to any abstracting that we do on the basis of our perception.  Existence is indubitable, and existence is in opposition to the abstraction of objectivity (TW 225).  That we are body, of course, naturally lends us to think of the body in terms of object.  But individuals who resort to seeing the self and the world in terms of functionality are ontologically deficient because not only can they not properly respond to the needs of others, but they have become isolated and independent from others.  It is our active freedom that prevents us from the snare of objectifying the self, and which brings us into relationships with others.

When we are able to act freely, we can move away from the isolated perspective of the problematic man (“I am body only,”) to that of the participative subject (“I am a being among beings”) who is capable of interaction with others in the world.  Marcelian participation is possible through a special type of reflection in which the subject views herself as a being among beings, rather than as an object.  This reflection is secondary reflection, and is distinguished from both primary reflection and mere contemplation.  Primary reflection explains the relationship of an individual to the world based on her existence as an object in the world, whereas secondary reflection takes as its point of departure the being of the individual among others.  The goal of primary reflection, then, is to problematize the self and its relation to the world, and so it seeks to reduce and conquer particular things.  Marcel rejects primary reflection as applicable to ontological matters because he believes it cannot understand the main metaphysical issue involved in existence:  the incommunicable experience of the body as mine.  Neither does mere contemplation suffice to explain this phenomenon.  Contemplation is existentially significant, because it indicates the act by which the self concentrates its attention on its self, but such an act without secondary reflection would result in the same egocentrism that Marcel attempts to avoid through his work.

Secondary reflection has as its goal the explication of existence, which cannot be separated from the individual, who is in turn situated among others.  For Marcel, an understanding of one’s being is only possible through secondary reflection, since it is a reflection whereby the self asks itself how and from what starting point the self is able to proceed (E 14).  The existential impetus of secondary reflection cannot be overemphasized for Marcel:  Participation which involves the presence of the self to the world is only possible if the temptation to assume the self is wholly distinct from the world is overcome (CF 22).  The existential upshot is that secondary reflection allows the individual to seek out others, and it dissolves the dualism of primary reflection by realizing the lived body’s relation to the ego.

Reflexive reflection is the reflection of the exigent self (see 5 below).  It occurs when the subject is in communion with others, and is free and also dependent upon others (as discussed in 2).  Reflexive reflection is an inward looking that allows the self to be receptive to the call of others.  Yet, Marcel does not call on the participative subject to be reflective for receptivity’s sake.  Rather, the self cannot fully understand the existential position without orientating itself to something other than the self.

4. Creative Fidelity

For Marcel, to exist only as body is to exist problematically.  To exist existentially is to exist as a thinking, emotive, being, dependent upon the human creative impulse.  He believed that, “As soon as there is creation, we are in the realm of being,” and also that, “There is no sense using the word ‘being’ except where creation is in view,” (PGM xiii).  The person who is given in a situation to creative development experiences life qualitatively at a higher mode of being than those for whom experiences are another facet of their functionality.  Marcel argues that, “A really alive person is not merely someone who has a taste for life, but somebody who spreads that taste, showering it, as it were, around him; and a person who is really alive in this way has, quite apart from any tangible achievements of his, something essentially creative about him,” (VI, 139).  This is not to say, of course, that the creative impulse is measurable by what we produce.  Whereas works of art most explicitly express creative energy, inasmuch as we give ourselves to each other, acts of love, admiration, and friendship also describe the creative act.  In fact, participation with others is initiated through acts of feeling which not only allow the subject to experience the body as his own, but which enable him to respond to others as embodied, sensing, creative, participative beings as well.  To feel is a mode of participation, a creative act which draws the subject closer to an experience of the self as a being-among-beings, although higher degrees of participation are achieved by one whose acts demonstrate a commitment to that experience.  So, to create is to reject the reduction of the self to the level of abstraction—of object, “The denial of the more than human by the less than human,” (CF 10).

If the creative élan is a move away from the objectification of humanity, it must be essentially tied relationally to others.  Creative fidelity, then, entails a commitment to acts which draw the subject closer to others, and this must be balanced with a proper respect for the self.  Self-love, self-satisfaction, complacency, or even self-anger are attitudes which can paralyze one’s existential progress and mitigate against the creative impulse.  To be tenacious in the pursuit-- the fidelity aspect-- is the most crucial part of the creative impulse, since creation is a natural outflow of being embodied.  One can create, and create destructively.  To move towards a greater sense of being, one must have creative fidelity.  Fidelity exists only when it triumphs over the gap in presence from one being to another—when it helps others relate, and so defies absences in presence (CF 152).

It is not enough to be constant, since constancy is tenacity towards a specific goal, which requires neither presence nor an openness to change.  Rather, creative fidelity implies that there is presence, if it is true that faithfulness requires being available (in the Marcelian sense, see 5) to another even when it is difficult.  (Interestingly, Marcel’s notion of fidelity means more than someone’s merely not being unfaithful.  A spouse, for example, might not physically cheat on her husband, but on Marcel’s view, if she remains unavailable to her partner, she can only be called “constant”.  She cannot be called “faithful”.)  Additionally, fidelity requires that a subject be open to changing her mind, actions, and beliefs if those things do not contribute to a better grasp of what it means to be.  Since fidelity is a predicate that is best ascribed by others to us, it follows that receptivity to the views of others’ is a natural component of fidelity.

But what is it that Marcel thinks we ought to be faithful towards? It isn’t simply to pursue the impetus of the exigent life, although that is involved.  More concretely, creative fidelity is a fidelity towards being free, and that freedom involves making decisions about what is important, rather than living in a state of stasis.  Marcel railed against indecision with respect to what is essential, even though such indecision, “Seems to be the mark and privilege of the illumined mind,” (CF 190) because truly free people are not entrapped by their beliefs, but are liberated by living out their consequences (see 2).

5. Exigence

Dominating Marcel’s philosophical development was the intersection of his interest in the individuality of beings and his interest in the relations which bind beings together.  An acceptable ontology must account for the totality of the lived experience, and so must have as a point of departure the fact that humans are fundamentally embodied.  From there, ontology must explain how an individual fits among other individuals, and so must account for what it means to experience and have relations in the world.  Ontological exigence is the Marcelian actualization of transcendence, which is manifested as a thirst for the fullness of being and a demand to transcend the world of abstract objectivity.  This desire to be fulfilled within the body, however, is not a desire for perfection (which cannot be achieved) but is instead, “The contradiction of the functionalized world and of the overpowering monotony of a society in which it becomes increasingly difficult to differentiate between members of society,” (V. II, 42).  The typical person (that is, the “Problematic man”) has become an object to him or herself through sheer busyness of life, through a lack of meaningful relationships with others, and through the intrusion of technological advancement.  The exigent person can transcend her problematicity—indeed, she, “Gradually develops individuality” (CF 149), and she does this by being aware of the self as a body in relation with, and in participation with, others in the world.  (The cognitive subject cannot seek the fulfilled state of the exigent self in a meaningful way, and the experiencing subject cannot see beyond herself as an object.  It is the participative subject, who is governed by the uniquely Marcelian doctrines of reflection, communion, receptivity, and availability, which can move from self-as-body to self-as-being among beings.)

The reflective focus of the exigent self occurs most effectively when the subject is involved in a community of people who are mutually receptive and accepting of others’ experiences and needs.  Just as secondary reflection must be active in order to participate with others, the exigent self’s reflexive reflection is rooted in an active, more developed sense of availability to others (see  3).  This availability is not passive; rather, the exigent self actively seeks out relationships with others, just as she is actively engaged in the concern for others.  Whereas a subject’s passivity can result in fear, hesitancy, and powerlessness, the action of the exigent self can allow her to positively change a situation for another person.  The force of the exigent life comes through the experience of being that is only found in sharing with others in being.  The most significant end achievable for an individual is to be immersed in the beings of others, for only with others does the self experience wholeness of being.  (This isn’t to say, of course, that the self will experience wholeness just in virtue of her being available to others.  Availability is a risk one takes, since it is only through availability that the potential for fullness emerges as possible.)

In opposition to exigence is the life of the problematic man.  There is a polarity between what is given in the technological world (a world in which things are objectified according to their function—biological, political, economic, social) and the fullness of being, which resists abstract determinations.  Marcel argued that, “Nothing is more awful than this reduction of man, of a human being by such distinctions,” (TW 225-6).  The exigent life is repelled by this reduction, and serves as a protest against it.  Exigence provides a recourse to a type of experience which bears within itself the warrant of its own value.  It is the substitution of one mode of experience for another; one that strives towards an increasingly pure mode of existence (VI ix).

6. Presence

The term “presence” is used in various ways in the English language, although each connote a “here-ness” that indicates whether or not a subject was “here”.  One of the differences in how we use the term is in the strength of a thing’s “here-ness”.  Two people sitting in close physical proximity on an airplane might not be present to each other, although people miles away speaking on a phone might have a stronger awareness of being together.  There is mystery in presence, according to Marcel, because presence can transcend the objective physical fact of being-with each other.   Presence is concerned with recognizing the self as a being-among-beings, and acknowledging the relevance of others’ experiences to the self, as a being.

The notion of presence for Marcel is comprised of two other parallel notions, communion and availability.  Together, communion and availability enable an individual to come into a complete participation with another being.  Although “presence” is found throughout Marcel’s work, he admits that it is impossible to give a rigorous definition of it.  Rather than working out a lexical definition of the term, we ought to evoke its meaning through our shared experiences.  Marcel demonstrates this by noting how easy it is to find ourselves with others who are not significantly present at all, and at other times we are present to those who are not physically with us at all.  The mark of presence is the mutual tie to the other.  For Marcel, it means that the self is “given” to the other, and that givenness is responsively received or reciprocated.  (The reciprocity of presence is a necessary condition for it.)  Presence is shared, then, in virtue of our openness to each other.

This openness is not linguistically based, since it is beyond the physical relation and communication among individuals.  Non-linguistic presence is possible for Marcel because of an aspect of presence Marcel calls “communion”.  Communion with other participative beings is renewing to the self as a result of the other giving to me out of who he is, rather than merely by what he says.  Marcel almost certainly borrows from Martin Buber’s I-Thou in his view of communion, in that Buber’s ontological communion is the free expression of those who are able to give and receive freely to each other so that an encounter with the other is possible, and for Marcel this communion is expressed as a free reception of the other to oneself (IB 136).  Communion-as-encounter, according to Marcel (GR 273), is encapsulated by the French en, whereas in English, within best represents the envelopment of one’s being that occurs in communion.  A shared experience allows for a more full understanding of one’s own being.  If the self is in communion with another, and is present to the other, the self is more present towards the self.  Communion with others can give new meaning to experiences that otherwise would have been closed to the self.

For interactions in which there is communication without communion, Marcel believes that the self becomes an object to the one with whom the communication is occurring.  And, where there is objectification, there cannot be participation, and without the availability of participation, there cannot be presence.  A key aspect of communion, then, is the way it limits the objectification of beings.  Marcel argues that one cannot have presence with—that is, one cannot welcome or gather to the self—whatever is purely and simply an object.  For objects, the self can take it or leave it, but presence can only be invoked or evoked (VI 208).  Presence that results from communion produces a bond between those who are in participation with another, who are receptive to another, and who are committed to sharing in each others’ experiences.

Communion is necessary for presence, but is entwined with Marcel’s notion of availability, disponibilité.  If it is true that participative beings can have communion with each other, and so encounter one another, then there must be another component to presence that enables a once-objectified person to respond to the encounter of communion.  The ability to yield to that which is encountered, and so to pledge oneself to another, is the component of presence that Marcel calls availability (HV 23).  Availability can be understood as being at hand, or handiness, so that a person is ready to respond to another when called upon.  The available subject seeks out other available subjects as individuals whose experiences can compliment and more fully speak to her.  Of course, for another’s experiences to speak to the subject, she must be open to the influence and needs of the other.  But this openness cannot result in the objectification of the subject by the other.  To be available is not to be possessed as an object.  Rather, to be available means that that the best use the subject can make of her freedom is to place it in the other’s hands, as a free response to who the other is.  The subject is not an object to be disposed of, then, but a fellow subject in need of the influence of the experiences of the other.

The positive result of living an available life is that it makes the subject more fully aware of herself than she would be if she did not have the relationship.  No longer does the subject have to struggle with her facticity, but she can find contentment through the mutual presence—from the communion and availability she has with a community of beings, all of whom are committed to the same end.  Just as the joints of the skeleton are conjoined and adapted to bones, Marcel contends that the individual life finds its justification and its meaning by being inwardly conjoined, adapted, and oriented towards something other than itself (V I, 201-2).

There are, certainly, detriments to the life of presence that Marcel explicates.  He penned as many words on unavailability, indisponibilité as he did availability, and with good reason:  obstacles frequently occur when individuals attempt to coalesce their experiences to emerge as stronger, more cohesive beings.  Almost all occurrences of unavailability result form an individual seeking fulfillment through the objectification of the self.  To be unavailable is to be preoccupied with the self as an object, to be self-centered in such a way as to exclude the possibility of engaging with others as subjects (BH 74, 78).  The unavailable person is characterized by an absorption with her self, whether with her own successes and accomplishments or her own problems.  She can feel temporary satisfaction by wallowing in herself, but she only experiences herself as object, and so cannot be whole.  Whatever brief satisfaction the unavailable individual has, it is short-lived because she becomes encumbered—for Marcel, “used up”—by all of the things by which she attempts to define herself:  job, family, poor health, indebtedness, etc.  Marcel compares the encumbered, unavailable life, to a hand-written draft of a manuscript.  Just as the clutter of editing marks on a draft disables the author from figuring out what is important to the central ideas, the encumbered self no longer has access to her own point of view.  The result is frustration, apathy, or distrust in oneself or others.  The weight of encumbrance renders the self incapable of presence, and so the self becomes opaque.  The opaque person ceased to let his presence pass into the world, and so has blocked the experiences of others to help inform and shape his own.

7. Hope and the Existential Self

The existential life that Marcel paints as possible for humanity is largely one of hope—but not one of optimism.   Being in the world as body allows one to seek out new opportunities for the self, and so Marcelian hope is deeply pragmatic in that it refuses to compute all of the possibilities against oneself.  But the picture is not rosy.  Hope for Marcel is not faith that things will go well, because most often, things do not go well.  The depravity of the problematic man threatens to suffocate.  Yet, even if there is despair in our situation, there is always movement towards something more.  This movement towards is the philosophical project for Gabriel Marcel.  If there is always movement, and always more to reach for, the existential self is never complete (and indeed, this is why Marcel refused to categorize his existential project as a “system” or “dialectic”).  The mystery of being for the existential self is unsolvable, because it is not a problem to be solved.

The notion of “hope” for Marcel relies upon a significant Marcelian distinction between problem and mystery.  For the problematic man (see section 2) each aspect of life is reduced to the level of a problem, so that the self and all of its relationships, goals, and desires are treated as obstacles to be conquered.  Life is, for the problematic man, a series of opportunities to possess, and the body is alienated from the problematic man’s own corporeality.  Not only is such a person separated from his own being as a result, he is distanced from the true mystery of being.  If I am my body, and I want to inquire into being, I must grasp that being is a philosophical mystery to be engaged with rather than a problem to be solved.  The existential self, upon recognizing that the self is not something that is possessed, can then shift his thought from questioning the significance of his own existence as a matter of fact, to questioning how he is related to his body.  The vital cannot be separated from the spiritual, since the spiritual is conditioned on the body, which can then provide for opportunities and so, for hope.

The mystery of being, then, is a tale to be told, analyzed, probed, and worked toward.  To be sure, even as experiences change, society evolves, and relations emerge, the individual who seeks meaning through an investigation of their being will never be fully satisfied.  If Marcel’s ontology is viable, and the self can question who it is that asks Who am I?, then the self will find the answer to be constantly in flux.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bollnow, Otto Friedrich. “Marcel’s Concept of Availability,” In The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel:  The Library of Living Philosophers, 17.  Edited by Paul Arthur Schlipp and Lewis Edwin Hahn.  LaSalle, IL:  Open Court, 1984.  Abbreviated A.
  • Gallagher, Kenneth T. The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel. NY: Fordham University Press, 1962.  Abbreviated PGM.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. “Autobiographical Essay,” In The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel: The Library of Living Philosophers, 17.  Edited by Paul Arthur Schlipp and Lewis Edwin Hahn.  LaSalle, IL:  Open Court, 1984.  Abbreviated AE.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. Being and Having.  New York:  Harper & Row, 1965. Abbreviated BH.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. Creative Fidelity. NY:  Noonday Press, 1970.  Abbreviated CF.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. “Existence,”  New Scholasticism 38, no. 2 (April 1964).  Abbreviated E.
  • Marcel, Gabriel.  omo Viator: Introduction to a Metaphysic of Hope, tr. Emma Craufurd (Chicago:  Harper & Row), 1965.  Abbreviated HV.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. The Mystery of Being, Volume I and II.  Chicago: Charles Regnery Co, 1951. Abbreviated V. I and V.II.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. “Reply to Gene Reeves,” In The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel:  The Library of Living Philosophers, 17.  Edited by Paul Arthur Schlipp and Lewis Edwin Hahn.  LaSalle, IL:  Open Court, 1984.  Abbreviated GR.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. Tragic Wisdom and Beyond.  Evanston, IL:  Northwestern University Press, 1973.  Abbreviated TW.
  • Marcel, Gabriel. “Truth and Freedom,” Philosophy Today 9 (1965).  Abbreviated TF.
  • Strauss, E.W. and M. Machado, “Marcel’s Notion of Incarnate Being,” In The Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel:  The Library of Living Philosophers, 17.  Edited by Paul Arthur Schlipp and Lewis Edwin Hahn.  LaSalle, IL:  Open Court, 1984.  Abbreviated IB.
  • Zuidema, S.U. “Gabriel Marcel: A Critique,” Philosophy Today 4, no. 4 (Winter 1960).  Abbreviated SZ.

Author Information:

Jill Graper Hernandez
University of Texas at San Antonio
U. S. A.

Cheng Yi (1033—1107)

Cheng Yi was one of the leading philosophers of Neo-Confucianism in the Song (Sung dynasty (960-1279). Together with his elder brother Cheng Hao (1032-1085), he strove to restore the tradition of Confucius and Mencius in the name of “the study of dao” (dao xue), which eventually became the main thread of Neo-Confucianism. Despite diverse disagreements between them, the two brothers are usually lumped together as the Cheng Brothers to signify their common contribution to Neo-Confucianism.

Cheng Yi asserted a transcendental principle (li) as an ontological substance. It is a principle that accounts for both the existence of nature and morality. He also asserted that human nature is identical with li and is originally good. The way of moral cultivation for Cheng Yi is through composure and extension of knowledge which is a gradual way towards sagehood. These ideas deviate from his brother’s philosophy as well as from Mencius’. They were developed into a school for the study of li (li xue), as a rival to the study of the mind (xin xue), which was initiated by Cheng Hao and inherited by Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529). Cheng Yi’s thought had a great impact on Zhu Xi (1130-1200).

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Ontology
  3. Philosophy of Human Nature, Mind, and Emotion
    1. Human Nature and Human Feeling
    2. The Mind
  4. The Source of Evil
  5. Moral Cultivation
    1. Living with Composure
    2. Investigating Matters
    3. The Relation between Composure and Extension of Knowledge
  6. The Influence of Cheng Yi
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Cheng Yi, a native of Henan, was born into a family of distinguished officials. He used Zhengshu as courtesy name, but was much better known as Yichuan, the river in his home country. Cheng Yi grew up in Huangpo, where his father served as a local administrator. At fourteen, he and his elder brother were sent to study under the tutelage of Zhou Dunyi, the Song Dynasty’s founding father of Neo-Confucianism. At eighteen, driven by a strong sense of duty and concern for the nation, , he memorialized to the emperor a penetrating analysis of the current political crisis as well as the hardships of the common people. In 1056, led by his father, he and his brother traveled to Loyang, the capital, and enrolled in the imperial academy. There they made friends with Zhang Zai, who also eventually became a paragon of Neo-Confucianism.

With an excellent essay, Cheng Yi won the commendation of Hu Yuan, the influential educator, and he gained celebrity status in academia. Young scholars came to study with him from regions far and wide. In 1072, when Cheng Hao was dismissed from his government office, Cheng Yi organized a school with him and started his life-long career as a private tutor. Time and again he turned down offers of appointment in the officialdom. Nonetheless, he maintained throughout his life a concern for state affairs and was forthright in his strictures against certain government policies, particularly those from the reform campaign of Wang Anshi. As the reformers were ousted in 1085, Cheng Yi was invited by the emperor to give political lectures regularly. He did so for twenty months, until political attacks put an end to his office.

At the age of sixty, Cheng Yi drafted a book on the Yizhuan (Commentary on the Book of Changes) and laid plans for its revision and publication in ten years. In 1049, he finished the revision complete with a foreword. He then turned to annotate the Lunyu (Analects), the Mengzi (Mencius), the Liji (Record of Ritual) and the Chunqiu (Spring and Autumn Annals). In the following year he began working on the Chunqiu Zhuan (Commentary on Spring and Autumn Annals). However, in 1102, as the reformers regained control, he was impeached on charges of “evil speech.” As a result, he was prohibited from teaching, and his books were banned and destroyed. In 1109 he suffered a stroke. Sensing the imminent end of his life, he ignored the restriction on teaching and delivered lectures on his book Yizhuan. He died in September of that year.

Apart from the book mentioned above, Cheng Yi left behind essays, poems and letters. These are collected in Works of the Cheng Brothers (Er Cheng Ji), which also carries his conversations as recorded by his disciples. Works of the Cheng Brothers is an amended version of Complete Works of the Two Chengs (the earliest version was published during the Ming dynasty), which includes Literary Remains (Yishu), Additional Works (Waishu), Explanation of Classics (Jingshuo), Collections of Literary Works (Wenyi), Commentary on the Book of Change (Zhouyi Zhuan) and Selected Writings (Cuiyan). Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsi lu) which was compiled by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and Lu Zuqian (1137-1181), also collected many of Cheng Yi’s conversations.

2. Ontology

The concept of li is central to Cheng Yi’s ontology. Although not created by the Cheng brothers, it attained a core status in Neo-Confucianism through their advocacy. Thus, Neo-Confucianism is also called the study of li (li xue). The many facets of li are translatable in English as “principle,” “pattern,” “reason,” or “law.” Sometimes it was used by the Chengs as synonymous with dao, which means the path. When so used, it referred to the path one should follow from the moral point of view. Understood as such, li plays an action-guiding role similar to that of moral laws. Apart from the moral sense, li also signifies the ultimate ground for all existence. This does not mean that li creates all things, but rather that li plays some explanatory role in making them the particular sorts of things they are. Therefore, li provides a principle for every existence. While Cheng Yi was aware that different things have different principles to account for their particular existence, he thought that these innumerable principles amounted to one principle. This one principle is the ultimate transcendental ground of all existence, which Zhu Xi later termed taiji (“great ultimate”) – the unitary basis of the dynamic, diverse cosmos. While the ultimate principle possesses the highest universality, the principle for a certain existence represents the specific manifestation of this ultimate principle. Therefore the latter can be understood as a particularization of the former.

Apparently for Cheng Yi, li is both the principle for nature and that for morality. The former governs natural matters; the latter, human affairs. To illustrate this with Cheng’s example, li is the principle by which fire is hot and water is cold. It is also the principle that regulates the relation between father and son, requiring that the father be paternal and the son be filial.

As the principle of morality, li is ontologically prior to human affairs. It manifests itself in an individual affair in a particular situation. Through one’s awareness, pre-existent external li develops into an internal principle within the human heart-mind (xin). On the other hand, as the principle of nature, li is also ontologically prior to a multitude of things. It manifests itself in the vital force (qi) of yin-yang. The relationship between li and yin-yang is sometimes misconstrued as one of identity or coextensivity, but Cheng Yi’s description of the relationship between the two clearly indicates otherwise.For him, li is not the same thing as yin-yang, but rather is what brings about the alternation or oscillation between yin and yang. Although li and qi belong to two different realms -- namely, the realm “above form” (xing er shang) and the realm “below form” (xing er xia) -- they cannot exist apart from one another. He clearly stated that, apart from yin-yang, there is no dao.

In summary, no matter whether as the principle of nature or that of morality, li serves as an expositional principle which accounts for what is and what should be from an ontological perspective. Therefore, as Mou Zongsan argued, for Cheng Yi, li does not represent an ever producing force or activity, as his brother Cheng Hao perceived, but merely an ontological ground for existence in the realm of nature as well as morality.

3. Philosophy of Human Nature, Mind, and Emotion

a. Human Nature and Human Feeling

Human nature (xing) has been a topic of controversy since Mencius championed the view that human nature is good (xing shan). The goodness of human nature in this sense is called the “original good,” which signifies the capacity of being compassionate and distinguishing between the good and the bad. Cheng Yi basically adopted Mencius’ view on this issue and further provided an ontological ground for it. He claimed that human nature and dao are one, thus human nature is equivalent to li. Human nature is good since dao and li are absolute good, from which moral goodness is generated. In this way Cheng Yi elevated the claim that human nature is good to the level of an ontological claim, which was not so explicit in Mencius.

According to Cheng Yi, all actions performed from human nature are morally good. Presenting itself in different situations, human nature shows the different aspects of li -- namely, humanity (ren), righteousness (yi), propriety (li), wisdom (qi), and trustworthiness (xin). (These five aspects of li also denote five aspects of human nature.) Human beings are able to love since ren is inherent in their nature. When the heart-mind of compassion is generated from ren, love will arise. Nevertheless, love belongs to the realm of feeling (qing) and therefore it is not human nature. (Neo-Confucians tended to regard human feelings as responses of human nature to external things.) Cheng Yi argued that we can be aware of the principle of ren inherent in us by the presentation of the heart-mind of compassion. Loyalty (zhong) and empathy (shu) are only feelings and, thus, they are not human nature. Because of ren, human beings are able to love, be loyal and be empathetic. Nevertheless, to love, in Cheng Yi’s words, is only the function (yong) of ren and to be empathetic is its application.

As a moral principle inherent in human nature, ren signifies impartiality. When one is practicing ren, one acts impartially, among other things. Ren cannot present itself but must be embodied by a person. Since love is a feeling, it can be right or wrong. It may be said that ren is the principle to which love should conform. In contrast to Cheng Hao’s theory that ren represents an ever producing and reproducing force, ren for Cheng Yi is only a static moral principle.

Ren, understood as a moral principle that has the same ontological status as li or dao, is a substance (ti) while feeling of compassion or love is a function. Another function of ren consists in filial piety (xiao) and fraternal duty (ti). These have been regarded by Chinese people as cardinal virtues since the time of the early Zhou dynasty. It was claimed in the Analects that filial piety and fraternal duty are the roots of ren. However, Cheng Yi gave a re-interpretation by asserting that filial piety and fraternal duty are the roots of practicing ren. Again, this shows that for Cheng Yi, ren is a principle, and filial piety and fraternal duty are only two of the ways of actualizing it. When one applies ren to the relationship of parents and children, one will act as filial, and to the relationship between siblings, one will act fraternally. Moreover, Cheng Yi considered filial piety and fraternal duty the starting points of practicing ren.

Having said that ren is substance whereas love, filial piety, and fraternal duty are its functions, it should be noted that according to Cheng Yi the substance cannot activate itself and reveal its function. The application of ren mentioned above merely signifies that the mind and feeling of a person should conform to ren in dealing with various relationships or situations. This is what the word “static” used in the previous paragraph means. Thus understood, ren as an aspect of human nature deviates from Mencius’ perception, as well as the perception in The Doctrine of the Mean (Zhong Yong) and the Commentary of the Book of Change, as Mou Zongsan pointed out. Mou also argued that the three sources mentioned have formed a tradition of understanding dao both as a substance and as an activity. Not surprisingly, Cheng Yi’s view on human nature and li is quite different from his brother Cheng Hao’s.

By the same token, other aspects in human nature such as righteousness, propriety, wisdom and trustworthiness are mere principles of different human affairs. One should seek conformity with these principles in dealing with issues in ordinary life.

b. Mind

The duality of li and qi in Cheng Yi’s ontology also finds expression in his ethics, resulting in the tripartite division of human nature, human mind and human feeling. In Cheng Yi’s ethics, the mind of a human being does not always conform to his nature; therefore a human sometimes commits morally bad acts. This is due to the fact that human nature belongs to the realm of li and the mind and feelings belong to the realm of qi. Insofar as the human mind is possessed by desires which demand satisfaction, it is regarded as dangerous. Although ontologically speaking li and qi are not separable, desires and li contradict one another. Cheng Yi stressed that only when desires are removed can li be restored. When this happens, Cheng maintained, the mind will conform to li, and it will transform from a human mind (ren xin) to a mind of dao (dao xin). Therefore, human beings should cultivate the human mind in order to facilitate the above transformation. For Cheng Hao, however, li is already inherent in one’s heart-mind, and one only needs to activate one’s heart-mind for it to be in union with li. The mind does not need to seek conformity with li to become a single entity, as Cheng Yi suggested. It is evident that the conception of the mind in Cheng Yi’s ethics also differs from that in Mencius’ thought. Mencius considered the heart-mind as the manifestation of human nature, and if the former is fully activated, the latter will be fully actualized. For Mencius, the two are identical. Yet for Cheng Yi, li is identical with human nature but lies outside the mind. This difference of the two views later developed into two schools in Neo-Confucianism: the study of li (li xue) and the study of xin (xin xue). The former was initiated by Cheng Yi and developed by Zhu Xi and the latter was initiated by Cheng Hao and inherited by Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming.

4. The Source of Evil

According to Cheng Yi, every being comes into existence through the endowment of qi. A person’s endowment contains various qualities of qi, some good and some bad. These qualities of qi are described in terms of their being “soft” or “hard,” “weak” or “strong,” and so forth. Since the human mind belongs to the realm of qi, it is liable to be affected by the quality of qi, and evil (e) will arise from the endowment of unbalanced and impure allotments of qi.

Qi is broadly used to account for one’s innate physical and mental characteristics. Apart from qi, the native endowment (cai) would also cause evil. Compared to qi, cai is more specific and refers to a person’s capacity for both moral and non-moral pursuits. Cai is often translated as “talent.” It influences a person’s moral disposition as well as his personality. Zhang Zai coined a term “material nature” (qizhi zhi xing), to describe this natural endowment. Although Cheng Yi adopted the concept of material nature, A.C. Graham noted that the term appeared only once in the works of the Cheng Brothers as a variant for xingzhi zhi xing. Nevertheless, this variant has superseded the original reading in many texts. Cheng Yi thought that native endowment would incline some people to be good and others to be bad from early childhood. He used an analogy to water in order to illustrate this idea: some water flows all the way to the sea without becoming dirty, but some flows only a short distance and becomes extremely turbid. Yet the water is the same. Similarly, the native endowment of qi could be pure or not. However, Cheng Yi emphasized that although the native endowment is a constraint on ordinary people transforming, they still have the power to override this endowment as long as they are not self-destructive (zibao) or in self-denial (ziqi). Cheng Yi admitted that the tendency to be self-destructive or in self-denial is also caused by the native endowment. However, since such people possess the same type of human nature as any others, they can free themselves from being self-destructive or in self-denial. Consequently Cheng Yi urged people to make great efforts to remove the deviant aspects of qi which cause the bad native endowment and to nurture one’s qi to restore its normal state. Once qi is adjusted, no native endowment will go wrong.

As mentioned in the previous section, Cheng Yi maintained that human desires are also the origin of selfishness, which leads to evil acts. The desires which give rise to moral badness need not be a self-indulgent kind. Since they are by nature partial, one will err if one is activated by desire. Any intention with the slightest partiality will obscure one’s original nature; even the “flood-like qi” described by Mencius (Mengzi 2A2) will collapse. The ultimate aim of moral practice is then to achieve sagehood where one will do the obligatory things naturally without any partial intention.

The Cheng brothers wrote, “It lacks completeness to talk about human nature without referring to qi and it lacks illumination to talk about qi without referring to human nature.” Cheng Yi’s emphasis on the influence of qi on the natural moral dispositions well reflects this saying. He put considerable weight on the endowment of qi; nevertheless, the latter by no means playsa deterministic role in moral behavior.

5. Moral Cultivation

a. Living with Composure

For Cheng Yi, to live with composure (ju jing) is one of the most important ways for cultivating the mind in order to conform with li. Jing appeared in the Analects as a virtue, which Graham summarized as “the attitude one assumes towards parents, ruler, spirits; it includes both the emotion of reverence and a state of self-possession, attentiveness, concentration.” It is often translated as “reverence” or “respect.” Hence in the Analects, respect is a norm which requires one to collect oneself and be attentive to a person or thing. Respect necessarily takes a direct object. Cheng Yi interpreted jing as the unity of the mind, and Graham proposed “composure” as the translation. As Graham put it, for Cheng Yi, composure means “making unity the ruler of the mind” (zhu yi). What is meant by unity is to be without distraction. In Cheng Yi’s own words, if the mind goes neither east nor west, then it will remain in equilibrium. When one is free from distraction, one can avoid being distressed by confused thoughts. Cheng Yi said that unity is called sincerity (cheng). To preserve sincerity one does not need to pull it in from outside. Composure and sincerity come from within. One only needs to make unity the ruling consideration, and then sincerity will be preserved. If one cultivates oneself according to this way, eventually li will become plain. Understood as such, composure is a means for nourishing the mind. Cheng Yi clearly expressed that being composed is the best way for a human being to enter into dao.

Cheng Yi urged the learner to cultivate himself by “being composed and thereby correcting himself within.” Furthermore, he indicated that merely by controlling one’s countenance and regulating one’s thought, composure will come spontaneously. It is evident that controlling one’s countenance and regulating one’s thought is an empirical way of correcting oneself within. Such a way matches the understanding of the mind as an empirical mind which belongs to qi. Mou Zongsan pointed out that this way of cultivating the empirically composed mind is quite different from Mencius’ way of moral cultivation. For the latter, the cultivation aims at the awareness of the moral heart-mind, a substance identical with Heaven. Since the mind and li are not identical in Cheng Yi’s philosophy, they are two entities even though one has been cultivating one’s mind for a long time, and what one can hope to achieve is merely always to be in conformity with li.

b. Investigating Matters

To achieve the ultimate goal of apprehending li, Cheng Yi said, one should extend one’s knowledge (zhi zhi) by investigating matters (ge wu). The conception of extending knowledge by investigating matters originates from the Great Learning (Da Xue), where the eight steps of practicing moral cultivation by the governor who wanted to promote morality throughout the kingdom were illustrated. Cheng Yi expounded the idea in “the extension of knowledge lies in the investigation of things” in the Great Learning by interpreting the key words in “the investigation of matters.” The word “investigation” (ge) means “arrive at” and “matters” (wu) means “events.” He maintained that in all events there are principles (li) and to arrive at those principles is ge wu. No matter whether the events are those that exist in the world or within human nature, it is necessary to investigate their principles to the utmost. That means one should, for instance, investigate the principle by which fire is hot and that by which water is cold, also the principles embodied in the relations between ruler and minister, father and son, and the like. Thus understood, the investigation of things is also understood as exhausting the principles (qiong li). Cheng Yi emphasized that these principles are not outside of, but already within, human nature.

Since for every event there is a particular principle, Cheng Yi proposed that one should investigate each event in order to comprehend its principle. He also suggested that it is profitable to investigate one event after another, day after day, as after sufficient practice, the interrelations among the principles will be evident. Cheng Yi pointed out that there are various ways to exhaust the principles, for instance, by studying books and explaining the moral principles in them; discussing prominent figures, past and present, to distinguish what is right and wrong in their actions; experiencing practical affairs and dealing with them appropriately.

Cheng Yi rejected the idea that one should exhaust all the events in the world in order to exhaust the principles. This might appear to conflict with the proposition that one should investigate into each event, yet the proposal can be understood as “one should investigate into each event that one happens to encounter.” Cheng Yi claimed that if the principle is exhausted in one event, for the rest one can infer by analogy. This is possible is due to the fact that innumerable principles amount to one.

From the above exposition of Cheng Yi’s view on the investigations of matters, the following implication can be made. First, the knowledge obtained by investigating matters is not empirical knowledge. Cheng Yi was well aware of the distinction between the knowledge by observation and the knowledge of morals as initially proposed by Zhang Zai. The former is about the relations among different matters and therefore is gained by observing matters in the external world. The latter cannot be gained by observation. Since Cheng Yi said that the li exhausted by investigating matters is within human nature, it cannot be obtained by observation, and thus is not any kind of empirical knowledge.

This may be confusing, but if we compare Cheng Yi’s kind of knowledge to scientific knowledge, things may become clearer. It is important to distinguish between the means one uses to get knowledge, and the constituents of that knowledge. One uses observation as a means to better understand the nature of external things. But the knowledge one gains isn’t observational by nature. It isn’t the sort of knowledge scientists have in mind when they say “objects with mass are drawn toward one another.” It differs in at least two respects: first, the content of one’s knowledge is something we can draw from ourselves, as we have the same li in our nature; second, the knowledge we gain doesn’t rest on the authority of observations. We know it without having to put our trust in external observations, since the knowledge is drawn from inside ourselves. We only need external observation in order to liberate this internal knowledge. So we need it as a means, but no more.

Second, according to Cheng Yi, investigating matters literally means arriving at an event. It implies that the investigation is undertaken in the outside world where the mind will be in contact with the event. Only through the concrete contact with the eventis the act of knowing concretely carried out and the principles can be exhausted.

Third, Cheng Yi believed that through the investigation of matters the knowledge obtained is the knowledge of morals. When one is in contact with an event, one will naturally apprehend the particulars of the event and the knowledge by observation will thus form. Nevertheless, in order to gain the knowledge of morals one should not stick to those concrete particulars but go beyond to apprehend the transcendental principle which accounts for the nature and morals. Thus, the concrete events are only necessary means to the knowledge of morals. They themselves are not constituents of the knowledge in question, as Mou Zongsan argued.

c. The Relation between Composure and Extension of Knowledge

According to Cheng Yi, learning to be an exemplary person (junzi) lies in self-reflection. Self-reflection in turn lies in the extension of knowledge. Also, only by self-reflection can one transform the knowledge by observation into the knowledge of morals. This is possible only if the mind is cultivated in the maintenance of composure. With composure in place, one can apprehend the transcendental principles of events. Cheng Yi made a remark on this idea: “It is impossible to extend the knowledge without composure.” This also explains the role composure plays in obtaining the knowledge of morals by investigating matters.

Contrariwise, obtaining the knowledge of morals can stabilize the composed mind and regulate concrete events to be in conformity with li. Cheng Yi described this gradual stabilization of the mind by accumulating moral knowledge as “collecting righteousness (ji yi).”

Self-reflection for Cheng Yi meant cultivating the mind with composure. However, as mentioned above, the mind cannot be identical with li; it can only conform to it since they belong to two different realms. Since the knowledge obtained by the composed mind comprises the transcendental principles, the knowing in question is a kind of contemplative act. Notwithstanding that, this act still represents a subject-object mode of knowing. On the contrary, the meaning of self-reflection for Mencius reveals a different dimension. The knowledge of morals gained by self-reflection is not any principle which the mind should follow. The knowing is an awareness of the moral mind itself through which its identification with human nature and also with li is revealed. Therefore the object of knowing is not the principle out there (inherent in human nature though) but the knowing mind itself. The awareness thus is a self-awareness. The reflection understood as such is not the cognition per se; it is rather the activation of the mind. In the act of activation, the dichotomy of the knowing and the known diminishes. Moreover, when the mind is activated, human nature is actualized and li will manifest itself. Hence, the mind is aware of itself being a substance, from which li is created. Here Cheng Yi draws upon the distinction between a thing’s substance, understood as its essential and inactive state, and the active state in which it behaves in characteristic ways. Anticipating that his account of the mind will be misread as suggesting that the mind has two parts -- an active and inactive part -- Cheng Yi clarifies that he understands the two parts to be, in fact, two aspects of one and the same thing.

6. The Influence of Cheng Yi

The distinctive and influential ideas in Cheng Yi’s thought can be summarized as follows:

  1. There exists a transcendental principle (li) of nature and morality, which accounts for the existence of concrete things and also the norms to which they adhere.
  2. This principle can be apprehended by inferring from concrete things (embodied as qi) to the transcendental li.
  3. This principle is static, not active or in motion.
  4. Human nature is identical with li, but this should be distinguished from the human mind, which belongs to the realm of qi.
  5. Ren belongs to human nature and love belongs to the realm of feeling.
  6. Moral cultivation is achieved gradually, through composure and the cumulative extension of knowledge.

Cheng Yi had tremendous impact on the course of Confucian philosophy after his time. His influence is most manifest, however, in the thought of the great Neo-Confucian synthesizer Zhu Xi, who adopted and further developed the views outlined above.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Chan, Wing-tsit, trans. Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology Compiled by Zhu Xi and Lu Zu-qian. New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • This contains selections of Cheng Yi’s work in English.
  • Cheng Hao & Cheng Yi. Complete Works of Cheng Brothers (Er Cheng Ji) (in Chinese). Beijing:Zhonghua Shuju, 1981.
    • This is the most complete work of the Cheng Brothers.
  • Graham, A.C. Two Chinese Philosophers: The Metaphysics of the Brothers Ch’êng. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court Publishing Company, 1992.
    • This is the only English monograph on the Cheng Brothers. It provides an in-depth discussion on the philosophy of Cheng Yi. The author also refers to the interpretations made by Zhu Xi.
  • Mou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san). The Substance of Mind and the Substance of Human Nature (Xinte yu xingte) (in Chinese), vol. II. Taibei: Zhengzhong Shuju, 1968.
    • This work is famous for its extraordinary depth and incomparable clarity in the study of Neo-Confucianism of Song and Ming dynasty. It provides a historical as well as philosophical framework to understand various systems of Neo-Confucianism in that period.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. Essentials of Neo-Confucianism: Eight Major Philosophers of the Song and Ming Periods. London: Greenwood Press, 1999.
    • This book on Neo-Confucianism is clearly written and thoughtfully presented. It contains a good summary of Cheng Yi’s thought.
  • Huang, Yong. “The Cheng Brothers’ Onto-theological Articulation of Confucian Values.” Asian Philosophy 17/3 (2007): 187-211.
    • A philosophical discussion on the Cheng Brothers’ ideas of the relations between their ontology and ethics.
  • Huang, Yong. “How Weakness of Will Is Not Possible: Cheng Yi on Moral Knowledge.” In Educations and Their Purposes: Dialogues across Cultures, eds. R.T. Ames and P. Hershock (Honolulu, Hawaii: University of Hawaii Press, 2007), 429-456.
    • This article attempts to bring Cheng Yi’s concept of moral knowledge into the current discourse on weakness of will.

Author Information

Wai-ying Wong
Lingnan University
Hong Kong, China

Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1724—1777)

daizhenDai Zhen, also known as Dai Dongyuan (Tai Tung-yuan), was a philosopher and intellectual polymath believed by many to be the most important Confucian scholar of the Qing (Ch’ing) dynasty (1644-1911 CE). He was also the foremost figure among the sophisticated new class of career academics who rose to prominence in the mid-Qing. A prominent critic of the Confucian orthodoxy of the Song and Ming dynasties (known today in the West as “Neo-Confucianism”), Dai charged his predecessors with philosophical errors that had dire moral consequences for their adherents and brilliantly showed them to be rooted in misreadings of the Confucian classics. Chief among these errors was the tendency to understand feelings and desires as being obstacles to proper moral deliberation and action, a view that Dai saw as opening to the door to frictionless moral judgments, free of calculations of benefit or harm and not responsible to the felt responses of others. Dai aimed to restore feelings and desires to prominence by assigning a central place to sympathetic concern (shu) in moral deliberation. He thus reconceived the fundamental nature of the Neo-Confucian universe in a way that explained moral claims in terms of the human affects. He accomplished this dramatic reconfiguration of the Neo-Confucian thought against the backdrop of social institutions that showed little enthusiasm for, and sometimes outright hostility to, his philosophical endeavors.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Moral Agency
    1. Dai’s Critique of the Neo-Confucian Account
    2. Sympathy as a Form of Moral Deliberation
  3. Human Nature and Moral Cultivation
  4. Metaphysics and Metaethics
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Born in 1724 to a poor cloth merchant of Anhui province, Dai Zhen emerged from an unlikely educational background, attending local schools because his father could not afford the customary private tutorials. By the time Dai was eighteen, however, his genius and scholarly accomplishment had won him the acclaim of his elders and shortly thereafter the backing of a reputable literary scholar in his own clan. Bolstered by a series of endorsements and his own evident academic success, Dai came under the tutelage of the famous classicist Jiang Yong (1681-1762), through whom he became acquainted with many figures in the thriving community of mid-Qing academics. Dai soon proved to be not just a precocious and prolific scholar but a versatile one as well. His 1753 commentary on the Poetry Classic was finished contemporaneously with his first major work in phonology, and both followed closely on the heels of a celebrated treatise in mathematics. Although Dai’s interest in philosophical topics was evident quite early, he did not finish his best-known treatises in this field of intellectual endeavor until late in life, the two most important being On the Good (Yuan Shan) and An Evidential Study of the Meaning and Terms of the Mencius (Mengzi ziyi shuzheng). Between these it is the Evidential Study that is generally regarded as his masterwork, being widely appreciated for its sophistication and rigor. By his own account, hisEvidential Study was his greatest labor of love. Several of the last years of his life were spent writing and revising it, and it is likely that he would have continued to revise the work if it were not for his untimely death 1777.

Dai became a leading figure in the dominant new philological or evidential studies (kaozheng) movement, partly because of his interest in mathematics, calendrical studies, and ancient languages and partly because of his exacting standards of argument. Yet Dais relationship to the philological movement was an uneasy one. Like other philological thinkers, he shared an interest in using hard evidence and careful exegesis to reconstruct the language and practices of the ancients. He also shared with many of them the deep conviction that the orthodox Confucianism of Zhu Xi (1130-1200), which by his time had reigned for several centuries, was thoroughly contaminated with Daoist and Buddhist ideas and needed to be corrected with the tools of evidential scholarship. But Dais contemporaries in philological studies tended to believe that the misreadings and obfuscations of orthodox Confucianism were an inevitable part of theoretical speculation about the meanings and principles (yili) of the classics. For Dai, in contrast, the purpose of evidential studies was to reconstruct the meanings and principlesincluding the ethics and metaphysicsof the Confucian canons ancient authors.

This difference of opinion regarding the study of meanings and principles appears to have led Dai to part with his philological contemporaries in two crucial ways. First, while the professional scholars of his time increasingly valued specialization in certain subfields such as astronomy or geography, Dai nevertheless remained a devoted generalist, seeing all of the various disciplines as potentially working together to reconstruct the often highly theoretical meanings of terms and moral practices contained in the classics. Second, while Dais contemporaries believed it was his contributions in fields such as phonology and mathematics that made him the most formidable scholar of his time, Dai himself believed his greatest contributions to be his treatises on such theoretical topics as human nature, metaphysics, and (especially) moral deliberation and cultivation. In his own lifetime Dais highest accolade was a prestigious position on the staff that compiled the Complete Collection of the Four Treasuries (Sikuquanshu) for the Imperial Librarya collection of classic texts that heavily favoredworks of philological interest. Admirers in Dais own era regarded his treatises on meanings and principles as a monumental waste of time, and most of his early biographers barely mentioned such work, even though it became the central focus of his thought and efforts by the end of his life. But while Dais more speculative labors may have been judged harshly in the mid-Qing, his own appraisal of his work and its importance has been vindicated by later scholars. He has come to be hailed as the foremost representative of Qing dynasty philosophy and is routinely presented as such in surveys of Chinese thought.

2. Moral Agency

a. Dai’s Critique of the Neo-Confucian Account

Dai presents his best-known philosophical work, the Evidential Study, as an indictment of Neo-Confucianism. Of particular concern to him is the reigning orthodoxy of Cheng Yi (1033-1107) and Zhu Xi (1130-1200), whose thought had been deeply embedded in China’s governing institutions for centuries, and whose very moral and metaphysical language had come into popular use. At the heart of Dai’s critique is an array of worries about the Neo-Confucian picture of moral agency, where acting well is conceived primarily as a matter of freeing certain native, spontaneous instincts from the influence of feelings and desires. Of particular concern to Dai is the view that merely by eliminating or paring away such feelings and desires one can somehow become a good moral agent. As Dai sees it, this view neglects not just the deliberative, non-spontaneous work that one must do in order to act well, but also the crucial role that affects should play in those deliberations. Thus his critique is aimed in particular at the idea that our native instincts, once freed of the influence of our feelings and desires, are somehow “complete and self-sufficient”—adequate by themselves to give proper moral guidance (Evidential Study, ch. 14, 27).

In Dai’s view, this Neo-Confucian account is factually wrong, and as such does profound injustice to the role that education and cultivation should have in the development of the moral understanding. If we see our work in moral self-cultivation as primarily subtractive or eliminative—as a matter of overcoming bad feelings and desires so as to let the refined parts of the nature act of their own accord—then, Dai maintains, it makes no sense to think of moral education as contributing to the growth and maturation of the moral understanding. What we learn in the process of study (xue) might be understood as having instrumental value, helping to free us from the grip of our bad dispositions and realize the dormant moral sensibilities in ourselves, but once that is accomplished the content of our knowledge would seem to play noconstitutive part in moral comprehension. It is this demotion of education to mere instrument that the erudite Dai Zhen finds to be deeply mistaken. When we learn from the classics, he argues, they have a transformative effect on the faculty of the understanding (xinzhi), helping it to see the morally salient features of one’s life more clearly and respond more appropriately (ch. 14). Just as the nourishment of food and water actually becomes a part of the thing it is meant to nourish, he maintains, so too do the contributions of one’s education become, in a psychological analogue to digestion, a part of the understanding (ch. 9, 26).

Dai is particularly troubled by the pernicious effects the Neo-Confucian account has on its adherents—and, after centuries of Neo-Confucian orthodoxy, on popular culture as well. When the account is strictly followed, he argues, it does not allow the feelings of others to have the right kind of purchase on our own moral evaluations and judgments. If the principal work of moral action lies in eliminating meddlesome emotions, Dai argues, then our deliberations could not be informed by personal acquaintance with the feelings of others (the kind we get from imagining ourselves asthe other person, which is presumably distinct from the kind we get by inferring merely from general rules or observational data). The sentiments stirred by such an acquaintance would be seen as interfering with the authentic expression of the good natural instincts within oneself. Left unchecked by a proper understanding of the felt responses of others, however, Dai maintains that a person’s moral conclusions are at best subjective “opinions” (yijian) and not what Dai calls “invariant norms” (buyi zhi ze)—so named because they represent views that could under ideal circumstances attain a kind of universal agreement across all times and places (ch. 4, 42). In several remarkable passages, Dai writes movingly about the abuses of power that such a doctrine would condone when adopted by those in a position to impose their decisions on the weak or institutionally disadvantaged, unconstrained by the feelings of the helpless people most affected by such decisions (ch. 5, 10).

Another pernicious feature of the Neo-Confucian account, and for Dai Zhen the most alarming one, is that it prevents proper consideration of benefits and harms from figuring in one’s moral deliberations. This problem inspires Dai’s most passionate remarks, as he notes repeatedly how the Neo-Confucian view would blind its adherents to the detrimental effects of their own actions. Unable to consult their desires, he argues, moral agents would have no practicable way of discerning what really matters to the well-being of others (nor, he hints, would they even be capable of recognizing what would or would not contribute to their own well-being). Combined with the first worry, about the inability of others’ claims to suitably inform one’s own personal deliberations, this leaves agents in what Dai describes as “a state of profound blindness,” unable to know what behaviors qualify as good and incapable of being alerted to their mistakes by others (ch. 4). When the doctrine of native self-sufficiency is deeply embraced, Dai concludes, “its harm is great, and yet no one is able to be aware of it” (ch. 43).

b. Sympathy as a Form of Moral Deliberation

Dai Zhen’s corrective for the shortcomings of the Neo-Confucian view (and its Daoist and Buddhist forebears) is an emotional attitude known as “shu,” whose meaning for Dai most closely approximates what we might call “sympathy” or “sympathetic concern.” The characteristic way of exercising shu, for Dai, is to imagine oneself in another’s shoes and so ask what one might desire if one were that person. By reconstructing another person’s desires one can better appreciate the extent to which certain states of affairs would benefit or harm that person. Dai assumes that some simulation of desires (and resultant feelings) is necessary to take proper account of potential benefits and harms, and he insists that the desire-averse picture of moral action upheld by the Neo-Confucians rules out such an exercise from the start. Thus he concludes that the Neo-Confucian picture is unable to fulfill what he takes to be a fundamental demand of any viable account of moral deliberation.

Not just any exercise of shu will provide reliable information about human well-being. For Dai, as for most other Confucian thinkers, shu can be done well or poorly. Given the rather cerebral form of moral cultivation Dai advocates, he believes that most moral agents need a great deal of education before they can make truly informed judgments. Even with this caveat in mind, however, Dai’s critics and occasionally his admirers have often constructed accounts of shuthat make it all too easy to dismiss.

One temptation for those whose intuitions are driven by the English word “sympathy” is to see Dai as advocating an exercise in mirroring or replicating the psychological states of others, especially their desires. If this were the case, shu would seem a poor indicator of the mirrored person’s well-being, since the person may well want things that are bad for her. But in fact Dai’s account of shu leaves it open to the moral agent to simulate counterfactual psychological states. Strictly speaking, Dai understands shu as the act of “taking oneself and extending it to others” (ch. 15), leaving it to the agent to judge which states would be the appropriate ones to synthesize.

A more common temptation is to say that Dai advocates bringing whatever desires we happen to have into our sympathetic reconstruction of the other’s point of view. If I am a solitary type of person, presumably, then I am to imagine others with the same preference for solitude. But this interpretation leaves Dai vulnerable to the charge of sympathetic paternalism, whereby one reconstructs another’s point of view on the basis of affective predispositions that are not the other’s. If this is how shu is supposed to work, then it would again seem a flawed measure of well-being, for others might benefit a great deal more from friendship and company than I, for instance.

The problem with this reading is that it assigns shu no critical role in selecting the desires that are to be synthesized. Just as the first interpretation depicts shu as naïvely mirroring or replicating the wants of another, the second depicts it as naïvely adopting one’s own wants, with no regard to whether these are true indicators of the other’s well-being. In fact, there is considerable evidence that Dai Zhen, at least in his more cogent moments, understands shu as being much more selective than either of these models would suggest. More than just imagining others with the same desires that one happens to have, Dai also sees shu as helping to identify the desires that really matter for welfare in the first place, which he understands as the desires that contribute to “life” (sheng) or “the fulfillment of life” (sui sheng). These are the basic desires which, upon sufficient reflection, we find that we all share—a common core that belong to what Dai sometimes characterizes as “the ordinary human feelings” (ren zhi changqing) and more often describes as the “true feelings” (qing) (ch. 5). In using shu, Dai suggests, one finds similarities that cut across distinctions in power or position: “If one genuinely returns to oneself and reflects on the true feelings of the weak, the few, the dull, the timid, the diseased, the elderly, the young, the orphaned, or the solitary, can those [true feelings] of these others really be any different from one’s own?” (ch. 2).

While there is evidence to suggest that Dai sees shu as having a robust role in selecting desires, it is less clear what the precise mechanism of selection is supposed to be. Possibly the very exercise of constructing a new point of view is supposed to help free one of the clutter of one’s own misguided or excessively idiosyncratic predilections. And Dai probably sees the special care or concern for a person inherent in shu as drawing attention to the desires that really matter to her, much in the way that grief or love draw attention to the features of a person to which the griever or lover is most attached. Dai also hints that there should be some sort of comparative exercise in shu, where one reconstructs the emotional reactions of others and measures them against those that one would have oneself under similar circumstances.

However Dai understands shu to work in detail, he is emphatic about its use as a form of moral deliberation. So understood, Dai suggests, it relies upon our desires in ways incompatible with the Neo-Confucian account of moral agency. His criticisms point to at least two such ways. First, proper moral action as Dai conceives of it requires that we use our desires in the process of deliberation. Second, it requires that we have a certain baseline of dispositions to want the right things. In other words, moral deliberation requires that we “have desires” both in an occurrent sense (as when I am described as actively feeling some inclination to eat good food) and in a dispositional sense (as when I am described as the kind of person who wants good food, even if I am presently working on an essay and not thinking about food at all). Thus, Dai’s picture of moral agency conflicts with the Neo-Confucian account not just in how it envisions moral deliberation but also in its conception of the kind of person that a good moral agent should be. Dai maintains that good human beings should have robust dispositions to desire beneficial things, which in turn requires that they have a healthy interest in their own well-being or life-fulfillment. Without the desire to “fulfill one’s own life,” Dai contends, one will “regard the despairing conditions of others with indifference” (ch. 10). Dai thus unabashedly asserts that even self-interested desires should figure prominently in the life of the virtuous moral agent.

3. Human Nature and Moral Cultivation

Like most Confucian philosophers, Dai Zhen shows a great deal of interest in the moral proclivities of human nature, a topic which by his time had long taken its bearings from Mencius’ (391-308 BCE) famous claim that the natural dispositions are good, and Xunzi (310-219 BCE) equally renowned polemic against this Mencian view. Although Dai is not alone in taking up this particular debate between Mencius and Xunzi, it nevertheless presents him with an important opportunity to sort through an apparent tension in his work, for it is Mencius that Dai takes to speak with final authority, and yet many of Dai’s own views carry an undisguised debt to Xunzian thinking about the relationship between nature, agency, and self-cultivation. Unlike most major figures who have weighed in on the Mencius-Xunzi debate, then, Dai has an interest in confirming much of Xunzi’s position while showing with great care and nuance how Xunzi’s views can be rendered compatible with the thesis that human dispositions are good by nature.

The parts of Xunzi’s doctrine that resonate most deeply with Dai Zhen concern the need to reshape the natural dispositions. If they are already more or less good, Xunzi reasons, it is hard to see why we would need an education that in any meaningful way transforms them. Our nature would already provide adequate or nearly adequate resources for moral self-improvement. Furthermore, Xunzi is plausibly read as upholding a picture of moral cultivation where the heart-and-mind must often overrule the desires, directing the body to act in ways contrary to the tug of one’s felt inclinations.

Like Xunzi, Dai is particularly concerned to develop a picture of the natural dispositions that would countenance a transformative account of self-cultivation. After all, one of the centerpieces of his philosophical work is a critique of the Neo-Confucian account of cultivation as merely subtractive or eliminative—as helping us to remove the bad parts of our nature, but forming no constitutive part of the cultivated self. Dai also shares with Xunzi the presupposition that this transformation requires some sort of power by the heart-and-mind to overrule the desires, and even uses language nearly identical to Xunzi’s to describe the mechanism of control—likening the heart-and-mind to the ruler (jun) of the body in that it issues orders of “permission or denial” (ke fou) to act on the desires of the latter (ch. 8). Thus Dai believes both that our dispositions begin in need of a great deal of reshaping and that one’s heart-and-mind must often resist the pull of the natural dispositions in order to reshape it.

One can consistently maintain this view while upholding the doctrine of natural goodness, Dai thinks, simply by acknowledging that there are parts of one’s nature that are not manifest in the raw, pre-cultivated state. Dai recognizes (as is now routinely observed) that much of Xunzi’s argument depends on a narrow understanding of “nature,” by which anything that appears before the deliberate activity of moral education is considered natural, and anything that appears afterwards is a product of human artifice. But Dai insists that one’s nature consists of latent capacities as well, potentialities which may not always be immediately manifest but which could nevertheless be said to be part of one’s nature, or in one’s nature, as the potential to grow into a peach tree is in the pit of a peach (ch. 25, 29).

In saying this, Dai takes himself to be making a much stronger and more capacious claim than one might think, for if human beings have in their nature the potential to become good, Dai believes, then this happy outcome could be brought about only by building upon nascent goodness, or virtues, already in existence. In other words, if we are to be capable of both understanding the good and being motivated by it, then we must already have some germ of moral understanding and some ability to delight in the good, even if these moral buds have no discernable effect on our behavior. This is because, as Dai puts it, moral inquiry and study are to one’s moral capacities as the nutritive powers of food and drink are to the material endowments of the body: one cannot use them to nurture or grow their intended objects unless some budding form of that object already exists (ch. 26).

This particular move in Dai’s argument might seem controversial. It assumes, after all, that the operations of moral inquiry and study really are like the nurturing of something that already exists, and not, for example, like the procreation or generation of something entirely new. But underlying this argument is a larger commitment to a picture of moral education as always building on some prior ability to appreciate the relevant norms, and it may have been this commitment that in the end makes the Xunzian account of the natural dispositions untenable in Dai’s eyes. For Dai, even at the earliest stages one learns by drawing upon one’s pre-existing grasp of propriety (li) and righteousness (yi), enlarging and expanding upon the understanding that one already has. In contrast, for Xunzi (as Dai reads him), those who aspire to goodness must start from scratch, without the benefit of nascent tendencies to appreciate the good (ch. 25-26).

4. Metaphysics and Metaethics

Most accounts of Dai Zhen’s place in the history of Chinese philosophy focus on his contributions to the ongoing dispute about the ontological status of li (pattern, principle) and qi (vital energy, material force), the two things most often proposed as the fundamental constituents of the universe in later Confucian metaphysics. Neo-Confucians such as Zhu Xi were arguably dualists about li and qi, acknowledging that the two could not exist apart from one another, but also seeing them as mutually irreducible. By contrast, Dai’s treatises seek to explain away the phenomena and the canonical terminology that strike so many of his predecessors as referencing irreducible notions of li, often by recasting them as references to the cyclical movements of yin and yang, or as particular arrangements of emotions or material bodies—all of these being typically understood as qi-based phenomena. Dai never declares himself a monist about qiin any unambiguous way,but he nevertheless devotes himself to showing how conceptions of the former should be explained in terms of the latter, and he is now frequently cited for the philological ingenuity and argumentative creativity that he brought to bear against Zhu Xi’s dualism.

As the great synthesizer of Neo-Confucian thought, Zhu Xi understands li as the cosmological patterns or principles that both make a thing the kind of thing it is (e.g., a human being rather than a goat) and determine the norms to which a thing should conform (e.g., serving one’s family, being of sound mind, and so on). Proper accounts of a thing’s kind and its norms should, Zhu believes, ultimately appeal to these patterns, not to the endowment of qi—the stuff that makes up one’s body and embodied feelings and desires—that a thing happens to have. Zhu understands li both as patterns that belong to the cosmos as a whole and, as Dai is fond of pointing out, as formless things that somehow exist inside all concrete individuals, including the heart-and-mind of every human being. These internalized li are, for Zhu, the “parts” or “manifestations” (fen) of the cosmological li, which implies in turn that the patterns belonging to each concrete individual are produced by (and thus harmonize with) the patterns that govern Heaven and Earth.

Dai Zhen’s trenchant criticism of the metaphysical picture offered by Zhu and other Neo-Confucians is that they wrongly took li and qi to be “two roots” (er ben)—that is, they mistakenly saw li as being “rooted” separately from qi (ch. 19). This critique encapsulates two general sorts of errors that he finds in the thought of his Neo-Confucian predecessors. The first is their tendency to see li as being separately “rooted” in the sense of having independent causal power. For example, Dai never embraces the view that the liare somehow responsible for making an individual thing the kind of thing it is. If li have anything to do with distinguishing between kinds, he maintains, it is simply because they represent the fine-grained features of things that we use to identify what kind they are, not the causal agent that makes them what they are (ch. 1). Similarly, he takes issue with the Neo-Confucian assertion that there is some li-based cosmological force that gives rise to qi’s tendency to fluctuate between two extremes (yin and yang). For Dai, the term for this purported cosmological force, known from the Classic of Change as “extreme polarity” or “taiji,” simply describes or names the fundamental oscillation in the cosmic qi. It is not a distinct force that makes the qi move as it does (ch. 18).

The second sense in which Dai’s predecessors see li as separately “rooted” is in conceiving of it as having independent explanatory power, such that one could give an adequate account of li without appealing to qi. The consequences of this sort of error are most apparent in moral claims. For Zhu Xi, to say that someone’s behavior is virtuous or good is to say that it is a proper expression of the li in her, which means in turn that it is a proper expression of some natural endowment of patterning imbued in her heart-and-mind by Heaven. Dai sees this as the wrong sort of story to tell, not just because it presupposes the existence of an unlikely causal agent (the formless “li” of the individual heart-and-mind), nor because he rejects the view that our Heavenly-endowed nature is predisposed in some small way to recognize and delight in the good (in fact, Dai seems to accept some version of this picture). Rather, Dai sees it as mistaken because it has nothing to do with why such behavior is good. Dai’s own preferred account invokes not the proclivities of Heaven as a basis for moral claims, but instead the proper arrangement of such worldly qi-based things as emotional dispositions and desires. Things are in accordance with their proper patterns, Dai asserts, when “the feelings do not err” (ch. 2).

Ever the attentive classicist, Dai traces much of the confusion he finds in the Neo-Confucian usage of “li” to a subtle misreading of the Confucian canon. In the Confucian classics, Dai notes, when the term “li” is used in its moral sense it tends to refer to the state of things when they are patterned in the right way, or “well-ordered” (tiao li) (ch. 1). Thus to speak of the “li” of something (e.g., a person, a boat) is not to refer to some formless object in that thing, but simply to the perfected state of that thing. The Neo-Confucians run afoul of this original sense of the word in assuming that “li” must denote something like an actual object, existing in esse. In so doing, Dai suggests, they open the door to a very different explanation of how someone becomes a “li” or “well-ordered” version of herself, where what makes her well-ordered is not simply that she has improved upon her feelings and desires in the right way, but that some quasi-object in her has expressed itself in the right way. For Dai, in contrast, it is enough to think of li as the state of things as they ought to be:

The exhaustive grasp of human li is nothing but an exhaustive grasp of what is imperative (biran) in human relations and daily affairs, and that is all. “What is imperative” is to push something to its greatest limit, where it can no longer be altered, and this is to speak of its perfection, not to trace out its root. (ch. 13)

5. Influence

At the time of Dai Zhen’s death he was widely revered for his scholarship in such fields as mathematics and phonology but ignored or dismissed as a philosopher. Among his contemporaries, the best-known admirers of his work on metaphysics and ethics were Hong Bang (1745-1779) and Zhang Xuecheng (1738-1801), though their admiration had little impact on other scholars of the era. Dai’s most successful student and friend, Duan Yucai (1735-1815), wrote a biography of Dai in which he dutifully reported his teacher’s profound devotion to and enthusiasm for his less popular philosophical works. But Duan never shared that enthusiasm and himself worked on conventional philological issues.

Only in the late nineteenth and early twentieth century were Dai’s On the Good and Evidential Study taken up with much interest, notably by reform-minded thinkers such as Zhang Taiyan (1868-1936), Liu Shipei (1884-1919), and Liang Qichao (1873-1929), who were particularly drawn to Dai’s suggestion that Cheng-Zhu thought countenanced abuses of power unchecked by the feelings and desires of the disadvantaged or powerless. Later, with the rise of Marxist thought in China, Dai’s attack on Neo-Confucian li—and his concomitant interest in explaining phenomena in terms of qi—made his work a convenient centerpiece for sweeping narratives about the decline of “idealism” and rise of “materialism” in the Ming and Qing dynasties. To some extent this preoccupation with Dai’s place in the li-qi debate lingers in the literature today, although scholars have increasingly turned to focus on his moral philosophy in its own right. Throughout the last two centuries, Dai has remained one of the chief sources of inspiration to those Confucian scholars who find Song and Ming Confucianism to be unviable or fundamentally contaminated with Daoist and Buddhist concepts. As such, he continues to be regarded as one of the most prominent internal critics of the Confucian tradition today.

6. References and Further Reading

Although the study of Dai Zhen’s life and work has become a minor cultural industry in the last couple of decades, there is still relatively little published material that focuses primarily on his philosophy, and even less that is accessible to those unfamiliar with the exegetical disputes prominent in his day. Readers are encouraged to begin with Feng Youlan and Philip J. Ivanhoe (below), and to make use of general surveys of the history of Chinese philosophy.

  • Chin, Ann-ping, and Freeman, Mansfield. Tai Chen [Dai Zhen] on Mencius: Explorations in Words and Meanings. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
    • A widely available summary of Dai’s life and thought, with a complete if not always careful translation of Dai’s most important philosophical work, the Evidential Study.
  • Ewell, John W. Reinventing the Way: Dai Zhen’s Evidential Commentary on the Meanings of Terms in Mencius (1777). Berkeley: Ph.D. dissertation in history, 1990.
    • Includes the strongest of the available English translations of Dai’s Evidential Study.
  • Feng Youlan [Fung Yu-lan]. A History of Chinese Philosophy,volume II. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • An English translation of this well-known scholar’s monumental survey of history of Chinese philosophy. The portion devoted to Dai Zhen is replete with ample quotations from Dai’s works.
  • Hu Shi. Dai Dongyuan de zhexue (The Philosophy of Dai Dongyuan). Reprinted in Taipei: Taiwan Shangwu, 1996.
    • An important and thorough if somewhat dated introduction to Dai Zhen’s philosophy and his place in Qing dynasty academics. This edition also includes the full texts of Dai’s On the Goodand Evidential Study,as well as several of his letters.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. “Dai Zhen.” In Confucian Moral Self Cultivation, 2nd ed. (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 2000): 89-99.
    • The best introduction to Dai Zhen’s moral thought in the English language. This work also exhibits the rare virtue (in Dai Zhen studies) of being accessible to those less familiar with classical Chinese language and Neo-Confucianism.
  • Lao Siguang. Xin bian zhong guo zhe xue shi (History of Chinese Philosophy, new edition). Taipei : San min shu ju, 1981.
    • A view of Dai Zhen from one of his more strident critics, presented as the final chapter of a survey of Chinese philosophy. Lao uses little charity in attempting to understand Dai, but his is one of the very few lengthy studies that focuses primarily on the philosophical content of Dai’s views.
  • Nivison, David S. “Two Kinds of ‘Naturalism’: Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng.” In The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy, ed. Bryan Van Norden (Chicago: Open Court, 1996): 261-82.
    • Nivison’s contribution to the academic “cottage industry” in studies of Dai’s influence on Zhang. Like most such studies, this piece is primarily an exercise in intellectual history, but Nivison’s passing summaries of Dai’s views are careful and insightful.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. “Mencius, Xunzi, and Dai Zhen: A Study of the Mengzi ziyi shuzheng.” In Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2002): 216-241.
    • An overview of Dai Zhen’s masterwork. This piece is particularly helpful in sorting out Dai’s several ways of understanding the doctrine that human nature is good.
  • Tiwald, Justin. “Dai Zhen on Human Nature and Moral Cultivation.” In the Dao Companion to Neo-Confucian Philosophy, ed. John Makeham (Dordrecht [Netherlands]: Springer, 2009): Ch. 20.
    • An extended overview and analysis of Dai’s ethics.
  • Yu Yingshi. Lun Dai Zhen yu Zhang Xuecheng (On Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng). Taipei: Dong da tu shu gu fen you xian gong si, 1996.
    • Originally published in 1976, this is one of the best Chinese language works on Dai Zhen’s philosophical life and writings, although the focus is on Dai’s influence on Zhang Xuecheng and Qing dynasty academics.

Author Information

Justin Tiwald
San Francisco State University
U. S. A.

Friedrich Nietzsche (1844—1900)

NietzscheNietzsche was a German philosopher, essayist, and cultural critic. His writings on truth, morality, language, aesthetics, cultural theory, history, nihilism, power, consciousness, and the meaning of existence have exerted an enormous influence on Western philosophy and intellectual history.

Nietzsche spoke of "the death of God," and foresaw the dissolution of traditional religion and metaphysics. Some interpreters of Nietzsche believe he embraced nihilism, rejected philosophical reasoning, and promoted a literary exploration of the human condition, while not being concerned with gaining truth and knowledge in the traditional sense of those terms. However, other interpreters of Nietzsche say that in attempting to counteract the predicted rise of nihilism, he was engaged in a positive program to reaffirm life, and so he called for a radical, naturalistic rethinking of the nature of human existence, knowledge, and morality. On either interpretation, it is agreed that he suggested a plan for “becoming what one is” through the cultivation of instincts and various cognitive faculties, a plan that requires constant struggle with one’s psychological and intellectual inheritances.

Nietzsche claimed the exemplary human being must craft his/her own identity through self-realization and do so without relying on anything transcending that life—such as God or a soul.  This way of living should be affirmed even were one to adopt, most problematically, a radical vision of eternity, one suggesting the "eternal recurrence" of all events. According to some commentators, Nietzsche advanced a cosmological theory of “will to power.” But others interpret him as not being overly concerned with working out a general cosmology. Questions regarding the coherence of Nietzsche's views--questions such as whether these views could all be taken together without contradiction, whether readers should discredit any particular view if proven incoherent or incompatible with others, and the like--continue to draw the attention of contemporary intellectual historians and philosophers.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Periodization of Writings
  3. Problems of Interpretation
  4. Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values
  5. The Human Exemplar
  6. Will to Power
  7. Eternal Recurrence
  8. Reception of Nietzsche’s Thought
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Nietzsche’s Collected Works in German
    2. Nietzsche’s Major Works Available in English
    3. Important Works Available in English from Nietzsche’s Nachlass
    4. Biographies
    5. Commentaries and Scholarly Researches
    6. Academic Journals in Nietzsche Studies

1. Life

Because much of Nietzsche’s philosophical work has to do with the creation of self—or to put it in Nietzschean terms, “becoming what one is”— some scholars exhibit uncommon interest in the biographical anecdotes of Nietzsche’s life. Taking this approach, however, risks confusing aspects of the Nietzsche legend with what is important in his philosophical work, and many commentators are rightly skeptical of readings derived primarily from biographical anecdotes.

Friedrich Wilhelm Nietzsche was born October 15, 1844, the son of Karl Ludwig and Franziska Nietzsche. Karl Ludwig Nietzsche was a Lutheran Minister in the small Prussian town of Röcken, near Leipzig. When young Friedrich was not quite five, his father died of a brain hemorrhage, leaving Franziska, Friedrich, a three-year old daughter, Elisabeth, and an infant son. Friedrich’s brother died unexpectedly shortly thereafter (reportedly, the legend says, fulfilling Friedrich’s dream foretelling of the tragedy). These events left young Friedrich the only male in a household that included his mother, sister, paternal grandmother and an aunt, although Friedrich drew upon the paternal guidance of Franziska’s father. Young Friedrich also enjoyed the camaraderie of a few male playmates.

Upon the loss of Karl Ludwig, the family took up residence in the relatively urban setting of Naumburg, Saxony. Friedrich gained admittance to the prestigious Schulpforta, where he received Prussia’s finest preparatory education in the Humanities, Theology, and Classical Languages. Outside school, Nietzsche founded a literary and creative society with classmates including Paul Deussen (who was later to become a prominent scholar of Sanskrit and Indic Studies). In addition, Nietzsche played piano, composed music, and read the works of Emerson and the poet Friedrich Hölderlin, who was relatively unknown at the time.

In 1864 Nietzsche entered the University of Bonn, spending the better part of that first year unproductively, joining a fraternity and socializing with old and new acquaintances, most of whom would fall out of his life once he regained his intellectual focus. By this time he had also given up Theology, dashing his mother’s hopes of a career in the ministry for him. Instead, he choose the more humanistic study of classical languages and a career in Philology. In 1865 he followed his major professor, Friedrich Ritschl, from Bonn to the University of Leipzig and dedicated himself to the studious life, establishing an extracurricular society there devoted to the study of ancient texts. Nietzsche’s first contribution to this group was an essay on the Greek poet, Theognis, and it drew the attention of Professor Ritschl, who was so impressed that he published the essay in his academic journal, Rheinisches Museum. Other published writings by Nietzsche soon followed, and by 1868 (after a year of obligatory service in the Prussian military), young Friedrich was being promoted as something of a “phenomenon” in classical scholarship by Ritschl, whose esteem and praise landed Nietzsche a position as Professor of Greek Language and Literature at the University of Basel in Switzerland, even though the candidate had not yet begun writing his doctoral dissertation. The year was 1869 and Friedrich Nietzsche was 24 years old.

At this point in his life, however, Nietzsche was a far cry from the original thinker he would later become, since neither he nor his work had matured. Swayed by public opinion and youthful exuberance, he briefly interrupted teaching in 1870 to join the Prussian military, serving as a medical orderly at the outbreak of the Franco-Prussian War. His service was cut short, however, by severe bouts of dysentery and diphtheria. Back in Basel, his teaching responsibilities at the University and a nearby Gymnasium consumed much of his intellectual and physical energy. He became acquainted with the prominent cultural historian, Jacob Burkhardt, a well-established member of the university faculty. But, the person exerting the most influence on Nietzsche at this point was the artist, Richard Wagner, whom Nietzsche had met while studying in Leipzig. During the first half of the decade, Wagner and his companion, Cosima von Bülow, frequently entertained Nietzsche at Triebschen, their residence near Lake Lucerne, and then later at Bayreuth.

It is commonplace to say that at one time Nietzsche looked to Wagner with the admiration of a dutiful son. This interpretation of their relationship is supported by the fact that Wagner would have been the same age as Karl Ludwig, had the elder Nietzsche been alive. It is also commonplace to note that Nietzsche was in awe of the artist’s excessive displays of a fiery temperament, bravado, ambition, egoism, and loftiness— typical qualities demonstrating “genius” in the nineteenth century. In short, Nietzsche was overwhelmed by Wagner’s personality. A more mature Nietzsche would later look back on this relationship with some regret, although he never denied the significance of Wagner’s influence on his emotional and intellectual path, Nietzsche’s estimation of Wagner’s work would alter considerably over the course of his life. Nonetheless, in light of this relationship, one can easily detect Wagner’s presence in much of Nietzsche’s early writings, particularly in the latter chapters of The Birth of Tragedy and in the first and fourth essays of 1874’s Untimely Meditations. Also, Wagner’s supervision exerted considerable editorial control over Nietzsche’s intellectual projects, leading him to abandon, for example, 1873’s Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, which Wagner scorned because of its apparent irrelevance to his own work. Such pressures continued to bridle Nietzsche throughout the so-called early period. He broke free of Wagner’s dominance once and for all in 1877, after a series of emotionally charged episodes. Nietzsche’s fallout with Wagner, who had moved to Bayreuth by this time, led to the publication of 1878’s Human, All-Too Human, one of Nietzsche’s most pragmatic and un-romantic texts—the original title page included a dedication to Voltaire and a quote from Descartes.  If Nietzsche intended to use this text as a way of alienating himself from the Wagnerian circle, he surely succeeded. Upon its arrival in Bayreuth, the text ended this personal relationship with Wagner.

It would be an exaggeration to say that Nietzsche was not developing intellectually during the period, prior to 1877. In fact, figures other than Wagner drew Nietzsche’s interest and admiration. In addition to attending Burkhardt’s lectures at Basel, Nietzsche studied Greek thought from the Pre-Socratics to Plato, and he learned much about the history of philosophy from Friedrich Albert Lange’s massive History of Materialism, which Nietzsche once called “a treasure trove” of historical and philosophical names, dates, and currents of thought. In addition, Nietzsche was taken by the persona of the philosopher Arthur Schopenhauer, which Nietzsche claimed to have culled from close readings of the two-volume magnum opus, The World as Will and Representation.

Nietzsche discovered Schopenhauer while studying in Leipzig. Because his training at Schulpforta had elevated him far above most of his classmates, he frequently skipped lectures at Leipzig in order to devote time to [CE1] Schopenhauer’s philosophy. For Nietzsche, the most important aspect of this philosophy was the figure from which it emanated, representing for him the heroic ideal of a man in the life of thought: a near-contemporary thinker participating in that great and noble “republic of genius,” spanning the centuries of free thinking sages and creative personalities. That Nietzsche could not countenance Schopenhauer’s “ethical pessimism” and its negation of the will was recognized by the young man quite early during this encounter. Yet, even in Nietzsche’s attempts to construct a counter-posed “pessimism of strength” affirming the will, much of Schopenhauer’s thought remained embedded in Nietzsche’s philosophy, particularly during the early period. Nietzsche’s philosophical reliance on “genius”, his cultural-political visions of rank and order through merit, and his self-described (and later self-rebuked) “metaphysics of art” all had Schopenhauerian underpinnings. Also, Birth of Tragedy’s well-known dualism between the cosmological/aesthetic principles of Dionysus and Apollo, contesting and complimenting each other in the tragic play of chaos and order, confusion and individuation, strikes a familiar chord to readers acquainted with Schopenhauer’s description of the world as “will” and “representation.”

Despite these similarities, Nietzsche’s philosophical break with Schopenhauerian pessimism was as real as his break with Wagner’s domineering presence was painful. Ultimately, however, such triumphs were necessary to the development and liberation of Nietzsche as thinker, and they proved to be instructive as Nietzsche later thematized the importance of “self-overcoming” for the project of cultivating a free spirit.

The middle and latter part of the 1870s was a time of great upheaval in Nietzsche’s personal life. In addition to the turmoil with Wagner and related troubles with friends in the artist’s circle of admirers, Nietzsche suffered digestive problems, declining eyesight, migraines, and a variety of physical aliments, rendering him unable to fulfill responsibilities at Basel for months at a time. After publication of Birth of Tragedy, and despite its perceived success in Wagnerian circles for trumpeting the master’s vision for Das Kunstwerk der Zukunft (“The Art Work of the Future”) Nietzsche’s academic reputation as a philologist was effectively destroyed due in large part to the work’s apparent disregard for scholarly expectations characteristic of nineteenth-century philology. Birth of Tragedy was mocked as Zukunfts-Philologie (“Future Philology”) by Wilamowitz-Moellendorff, an up-and-coming peer destined for an illustrious career in Classicism, and even Ritschl characterized it as a work of “megalomania.” For these reasons, Nietzsche had difficulty attracting students. Even before the publication of Birth of Tragedy, he had attempted to re-position himself at Basel in the department of philosophy, but the University apparently never took such an endeavor seriously. By 1878, his circumstances at Basel deteriorated to the point that neither the University nor Nietzsche was very much interested in seeing him continue as a professor there, so both agreed that he should retire with a modest pension [CE2] . He was 34 years  old and now apparently liberated, not only from his teaching duties and the professional discipline he grew to despise, but also from the emotional and intellectual ties that dominated him during his youth. His physical woes, however, would continue to plague him for the remainder of his life.

After leaving Basel, Nietzsche enjoyed a period of great productivity. And, during this time, he was never to stay in one place for long, moving with the seasons, in search of relief for his ailments, solitude for his work, and reasonable living conditions, given his very modest budget. He often spent summers in the Swiss Alps in Sils Maria, near St. Moritz, and winters in Genoa, Nice, or Rappollo on the Mediterranean coast. Occasionally, he would visit family and friends in Naumburg or Basel, and he spent a great deal of time in social discourse, exchanging letters with friends and associates.

In the latter part of the 1880s, Nietzsche’s health worsened, and in the midst of an amazing flourish of intellectual activity which produced On the Genealogy of Morality, Twilight of the Idols, The Anti-Christ, and several other works (including preparation for what was intended to be his magnum opus, a work that editors later titled Will to Power) Nietzsche suffered a complete mental and physical breakdown. The famed moment at which Nietzsche is said to have succumbed irrevocably to his ailments occurred January 3, 1889 in Turin (Torino) Italy, reportedly outside Nietzsche’s apartment in the Piazza Carlos Alberto while embracing a horse being flogged by its owner.

After spending time in psychiatric clinics in Basel and Jena, Nietzsche was first placed in the care of his mother, and then later his sister (who had spent the latter half of the 1880’s attempting to establish a “racially pure” German colony in Paraguay with her husband, the anti-Semitic political opportunist Bernhard Foerster). By the early 1890s, Elisabeth had seized control of Nietzsche’s literary remains, which included a vast amount of unpublished writings. She quickly began shaping his image and the reception of his work, which by this time had already gained momentum among academics such as Georg Brandes. Soon the Nietzsche legend would grow in spectacular fashion among popular readers. From Villa Silberblick, the Nietzsche home in Weimar, Elisabeth and her associates managed Friedrich’s estate, editing his works in accordance with her taste for a populist decorum and occasionally with an ominous political intent that (later researchers agree) corrupted the original thought[CE3] . Unfortunately, Friedrich experienced little of his fame, having never recovered from the breakdown of late 1888 and early 1889. His final years were spent at Villa Silberblick in grim mental and physical deterioration, ending mercifully August 25, 1900. He was buried in Röcken, near Leipzig. Elisabeth spent one last year in Paraguay in 1892-93 before returning to Germany, where she continued to exert influence over the perception of Nietzsche’s work and reputation, particularly among general readers, until her death in 1935. Villa Silberblick stands today as a monument, of sorts, to Friedrich and Elisabeth, while the bulk of Nietzsche’s literary remains is held in the Goethe-Schiller Archiv, also in Weimar.

2. Periodization of Writings

Nietzsche scholars commonly divide his work into periods, usually with the implication that discernable shifts in Nietzsche’s circumstances and intellectual development justify some form of periodization in the corpus. The following division is typical:

(i.) before 1869—the juvenilia

Cautious Nietzsche biographers work to separate the facts of Nietzsche’s life from myth, and while a major part of the Nietzsche legend holds that Friedrich was a precocious child, writings from his youth bear witness to that part of the story. During this time Nietzsche was admitted into the prestigious Gymnasium Schulpforta; he composed music, wrote poetry and plays, and in 1863 produced an autobiography (at the age of 19). He also produced more serious and accomplished works on themes related to philology, literature, and philosophy. By 1866 he had begun contributing articles to a major philological journal, Rheinisches Museum, edited by Nietzsche’s esteemed professor at Bonn and Leipzig, Friedrich Ritschl. With Ritschl’s recommendation, Nietzsche was appointed professor of Greek Language and Literature at the University of Basel in January 1869.

(ii.) 1869-1876--the early period

Nietzsche’s writings during this time reflect interests in philology, cultural criticism, and aesthetics. His inaugural public lecture at Basel in May 1869, “Homer and Classical Philology” brought out aesthetic and scientific aspects of his discipline, portending Nietzsche’s attitudes towards science, art, philology and philosophy. He was influenced intellectually by the philosopher Arthur Schopenhauer and emotionally by the artist Richard Wagner. Nietzsche’s first published book, The Birth of Tragedy, appropriated Schopenhaurian categories of individuation and chaos in an elucidation of primordial aesthetic drives represented by the Greek gods Apollo and Dionysus. This text also included a Wagnerian precept for cultural flourishing: society must cultivate and promote its most elevated and creative types—the artistic genius. In the Preface to a later edition of this work, Nietzsche expresses regret for having attempted to elaborate a “metaphysics of art.” In addition to these themes, Nietzsche’s interest during this period extended to Greek philosophy, intellectual history, and the natural sciences, all of which were significant to the development of his mature thought. Nietzsche’s second book-length project, The Untimely Meditations, contains four essays written from 1873-1876. It is a work of acerbic cultural criticism, encomia to Schopenhauer and Wagner, and an unexpectedly idiosyncratic analysis of the newly developing historical consciousness. A fifth meditation on the discipline of philology is prepared but left unpublished. Plagued by poor health, Nietzsche is released from teaching duties in February 1876 (his affiliation with the university officially ends in 1878 and he is granted a small pension).

(iii.) 1877-1882—the middle period

During this time Nietzsche liberated himself from the emotional grip of Wagner and the artist’s circle of admirers, as well as from those ideas which (as he claims in Ecce Homo) “did not belong” to him in his “nature” (“Human All Too Human: With Two Supplements” 1).  Reworking earlier themes such as tragedy in philosophy, art and truth, and the human exemplar, Nietzsche’s thinking now comes into sharper focus, and he sets out on a philosophical path to be followed the remainder of his productive life. In this period’s three published works Human, All-Too Human (1878-79), Dawn (1881), and The Gay Science (1882), Nietzsche takes up writing in an aphoristic style, which permits exploration of a variety of themes. Most importantly, Nietzsche lays out a plan for  “becoming what one is” through the cultivation of instincts and various cognitive faculties, a plan that requires constant struggle with one’s psychological and intellectual inheritances. Nietzsche discovers that “one thing is needful” for the exemplary human being: to craft an identity from otherwise dissociated events bringing forth the horizons of one’s existence. Self-realization, as it is conceived in these texts, demands the radicalization of critical inquiry with a historical consciousness and then a “retrograde step” back (Human aphorism 20) from what is revealed in such examinations, insofar as these revelations threaten to dissolve all metaphysical realities and leave nothing but the abysmal comedy of existence. A peculiar kind of meaningfulness is thus gained by the retrograde step: it yields a purpose for existence, but in an ironic form, perhaps esoterically and without ground; it is transparently nihilistic to the man with insight, but suitable for most; susceptible to all sorts of suspicion, it is nonetheless necessary and for that reason enforced by institutional powers. Nietzsche calls the one who teaches the purpose of existence a “tragic hero” (GS 1), and the one who understands the logic of the retrograde step a “free spirit.” Nietzsche’s account of this struggle for self-realization and meaning leads him to consider problems related to metaphysics, religion, knowledge, aesthetics, and morality.

(iv.) Post-1882—the later period

Nietzsche transitions into a new period with the conclusion of The Gay Science (Book IV) and his next published work, the novel Thus Spoke Zarathustra, produced in four parts between 1883 and 1885. Also in 1885 he returns to philosophical writing with Beyond Good and Evil. In 1886 he attempts to consolidate his inquiries through self-criticism in Prefaces written for the earlier published works, and he writes a fifth book for The Gay Science. In 1887 he writes On the Genealogy of Morality. In 1888, with failing health, he produces several texts, including The Twilight of the Idols, The Anti-Christ, Ecce Homo, and two works concerning his prior relationship with Wagner. During this period, as with the earlier ones, Nietzsche produces an abundance of materials not published during his lifetime. These works constitute what is referred to as Nietzsche’s Nachlass. (For years this material has been published piecemeal in Germany and translated to English in various collections.) Philosophically, during this period, Nietzsche continues his explorations on morality, truth, aesthetics, history, power, language and identity. For some readers, he appears to be broadening the scope of his ideas to work out a cosmology involving the all encompassing “will to power” and the curiously related and enigmatic “eternal recurrence of the same.” Prior claims regarding the retrograde step are re-thought, apparently in favor of seeking some sort of breakthrough into the “abyss of light” (Zarathustra’s “Before Sunrise”) or in an encounter with “decadence” (“Expeditions of a Untimely Man” 43, in Twilight of the Idols). The intent here seems to be an overcoming or dissolution of metaphysics.  These developments are matters of contention, however, as some commentators maintain that statements regarding Nietzsche’s “cosmological vision” are exaggerated. And, some will even deny that he achieves (nor even attempts) the overcoming described above. Despite such complaints, interpreters of Nietzsche continue to reference these ineffable concepts.

3. Problems of Interpretation

Nietzsche’s work in the beginning was heavily influenced, either positively or negatively, by the events of his young life. His early and on-going interest in the Greeks, for example, can be attributed in part to his Classical education at Schulpforta, for which he was well-prepared as a result of his family’s attempts to steer him into the ministry. Nietzsche’s intense association with Wagner no doubt enhanced his orientation towards the philosophy of Schopenhauer, and it probably promoted his work in aesthetics and cultural criticism. These biographical elements came to bear on Nietzsche’s first major works, while the middle period amounts to a confrontation with many of these influences. In Nietzsche’s later  writings  we find the development of concepts that seem less tangibly related to the biographical events of his life.

Let's outline four of these concepts, but not before adding a word of caution regarding how this outline should be received. Nietzsche asserts in the opening section of Twilight of the Idols that he “mistrusts systematizers” (“Maxims and Arrows” 26), which is taken by some readers to be a declaration of his fundamental stance towards philosophical systems, with the additional inference that nothing resembling such a system must be permitted to stand in interpretations of his thought. Although it would not be illogical to say that Nietzsche mistrusted philosophical systems, while nevertheless building one of his own, some commentators point out two important qualifications. First, the meaning of Nietzsche’s stated “mistrust” in this brief aphorism can and should be treated with caution. In Beyond Good and Evil Nietzsche claims that philosophers today, after millennia of dogmatizing about absolutes, now have a “duty to mistrust” philosophy’s dogmatizing tendencies (BGE 34). Yet, earlier in that same text, Nietzsche  claimed that all philosophical interpretations of nature are acts of will  power (BGE 9) and that his interpretations are subject to the same critique (BGE 22).   In Thus Spoke Zarathustra’s “Of Involuntary Bliss” we find Zarathustra speaking of his own “mistrust,” when he describes the happiness that has come to him in the “blissful hour” of the third part of that book. Zarathustra attempts to chase away this bliss while waiting for the arrival of his unhappiness, but his happiness draws “nearer and nearer to him,” because he does not chase after it. In the next scene we find Zarathustra dwelling in the “light abyss” of the pure open sky, “before sunrise.” What then is the meaning of this “mistrust”? At the very least, we can say that Nietzsche does not intend it to establish a strong and unmovable absolute, a negative-system, from which dogma may be drawn. Nor, possibly, is Nietzsche’s mistrust of systematizers absolutely clear. Perhaps it is a discredit to Nietzsche as a philosopher that he did not elaborate his position more carefully within this tension; or, perhaps such uncertainty has its own ground.  Commentators such as Mueller-Lauter have noticed ambivalence in Nietzsche’s work on this very issue, and it seems plausible that Nietzsche mistrusted systems while nevertheless constructing something like a system countenancing this mistrust. He says something akin to this, after all, in Beyond Good and Evil, where it is claimed that even science’s truths are matters of interpretation, while admitting that this bold claim is also an interpretation and “so much the better” (aphorism 22). For a second cautionary note, many commentators will argue along with Richard Schacht that, instead of building a system, Nietzsche is concerned only with the exploration of problems, and that his kind of philosophy is limited to the interpretation and evaluation of cultural inheritances (1995). Other commentators will attempt to complement this sort of interpretation and, like Löwith, presume that the ground for Nietzsche’s explorations may also be examined. Löwith and others argue that this ground concerns Nietzsche’s encounter with historical nihilism. The following outline should be received, then, with the understanding that Nietzsche’s own iconoclastic nature, his perspectivism, and his life-long projects of genealogical critique and the revaluation of values, lend credence to those anti-foundational readings which seek to emphasize only those exploratory aspects of Nietzsche’s work while refuting even implicit submissions to an orthodox interpretation of “the one Nietzsche” and his “one system of thought.” With this caution, the following outline is offered as one way of grounding Nietzsche’s various explorations.

The four major concepts presented in this outline are:

  • (i)  Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values, which is embodied by a historical event, “the death of God,” and which entails, somewhat problematically, the project of transvaluation;
  • (ii) The Human Exemplar, which takes many forms in Nietzsche’s thought, including the “tragic artist”, the “sage”, the “free spirit”, the “philosopher of the future”, the Übermensch (variously translated in English as “Superman,” “Overman,” “Overhuman,” and the like), and perhaps others (the case could be made, for example, that in Nietzsche’s notoriously self-indulgent and self-congratulatory Ecce Homo, the role of the human exemplar is played by “Mr. Nietzsche” himself);
  • (iii) Will to Power (Wille zur Macht), from a naturalized history of morals and truth developing through subjective feelings of power to a cosmology;
  • (iv)  Eternal Recurrence or Eternal Return (variously in Nietzsche’s work, “die ewige Wiederkunft” or “die ewige Wiederkehr”) of the Same (des Gleich), a solution to the riddle of temporality without purpose.


4. Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values

Although Michael Gillespie makes a strong case that Nietzsche misunderstood nihilism, and in any event Nietzsche’s Dionysianism would be a better place to look for an anti-metaphysical breakthrough in Nietzsche’s corpus (1995, 178), commentators as varied in philosophical orientation as Heidegger and Danto have argued that nihilism is a central theme in Nietzsche’s philosophy. Why is this so? The constellation of Nietzsche’s fundamental concepts moves within his general understanding of modernity’s historical situation in the late nineteenth century. In this respect, Nietzsche’s thought carries out the Kantian project of “critique” by applying the nineteenth century’s developing historical awareness to problems concerning the possibilities of knowledge, truth, and human consciousness. Unlike Kant’s critiques, Nietzsche’s examinations find no transcendental ego, given that even the categories of experience are historically situated and likewise determined. Unlike Hegel’s notion of historical consciousness, however, history for Nietzsche has no inherent teleology. All beginnings and ends, for Nietzsche, are thus lost in a flood of indeterminacy. As early as 1873, Nietzsche was arguing that human reason is only one of many peculiar developments in the ebb and flow of time, and when there are no more rational animals nothing of absolute value will have transpired (“On truth and lies in a non-moral sense”). Some commentators would prefer to consider these sorts of remarks as belonging to Nietzsche’s “juvenilia.” Nevertheless, as late as 1888’s “Reason in Philosophy” from Twilight of the Idols, Nietzsche derides philosophers who would make a “fetish” out of reason and retreat into the illusion of a “de-historicized” world. Such a philosopher is “decadent,” symptomatic of a “declining life”. Opposed to this type, Nietzsche valorizes the “Dionysian” artist whose sense of history affirms “all that is questionable and terrible in existence.”

Nietzsche’s philosophy contemplates the meaning of values and their significance to human existence. Given that no absolute values exist, in Nietzsche’s worldview, the evolution of values on earth must be measured by some other means. How then shall they be understood? The existence of a value presupposes a value-positing perspective, and values are created by human beings (and perhaps other value-positing agents) as aids for survival and growth. Because values are important for the well being of the human animal, because belief in them is essential to our existence, we oftentimes prefer to forget that values are our own creations and to live through them as if they were absolute. For these reasons, social institutions enforcing adherence to inherited values are permitted to create self-serving economies of power, so long as individuals living through them are thereby made more secure and their possibilities for life enhanced. Nevertheless, from time to time the values we inherit are deemed no longer suitable and the continued enforcement of them no longer stands in the service of life. To maintain allegiance to such values, even when they no longer seem practicable, turns what once served the advantage to individuals to a disadvantage, and what was once the prudent deployment of values into a life denying abuse of power. When this happens the human being must reactivate its creative, value-positing capacities and construct new values.

Commentators will differ on the question of whether nihilism for Nietzsche refers specifically to a state of affairs characterizing specific historical moments, in which inherited values have been exposed as superstition and have thus become outdated, or whether Nietzsche means something more than this. It is, at the very least, accurate to say that for Nietzsche nihilism has become a problem by the nineteenth century. The scientific, technological, and political revolutions of the previous two hundred years put an enormous amount of pressure on the old world order. In this environment, old value systems were being dismantled under the weight of newly discovered grounds for doubt. The possibility arises, then, that nihilism for Nietzsche is merely a temporary stage in the refinement of true belief. This view has the advantage of making Nietzsche’s remarks on truth and morality seem coherent from a pragmatic standpoint, in that with this view the problem of nihilism is met when false beliefs have been identified and corrected. Reason is not a value, in this reading, but rather the means by which human beings examine their metaphysical presuppositions and explore new avenues to truth.

Yet, another view will have it that by nihilism Nietzsche is pointing out something even more unruly at work, systemically, in the Western world’s axiomatic orientation. Heidegger, for example, claims that with the problem of nihilism Nietzsche is showing us the essence of Western metaphysics and its system of values (“The Word of Nietzsche: ‘God is dead’”). According to this view, Nietzsche’s philosophy of value, with its emphasis on the value-positing gesture, implies that even the concept of truth in the Western worldview leads to arbitrary determinations of value and political order and that this worldview is disintegrating under the weight of its own internal logic (or perhaps “illogic”). In this reading, the history of truth in the occidental world is the  “history of an error” (Twilight of the Idols), harboring profoundly disruptive antinomies which lead, ultimately, to the undoing of the Western philosophical framework. This kind of systemic flaw is exposed by the historical consciousness of the nineteenth century, which makes the problem of nihilism seem all the more acutely related to Nietzsche’s historical situation. But to relegate nihilism to that situation, according to Heidegger, leaves our thinking of it incomplete.

Heidegger makes this stronger claim with the aid of Nietzsche’s Nachlass. Near the beginning of the aphorisms collected under the title, Will To Power (aphorism 2), we find this note from 1887: “What does nihilism mean? That the highest values devalue themselves The aim is lacking; “why?” finds no answer.”  Here, Nietzsche’s answer regarding the meaning of nihilism has three parts. The first part makes a claim about the logic of values: ultimately, given the immense breadth of time, even “the highest values devalue themselves.”no long t use of such values into an abuse of the longer useful, turns what was once perhaps advan What does this mean?” According to Nietzsche, the conceptual framework known as Western metaphysics was first articulated by Plato, who had pieced together remnants of a declining worldview, borrowing elements from predecessors such as Anaximander, Parmenides, and especially Socrates, in order to overturn a cosmology that had been in play from the days of Homer and which found its fullest and last expression in the thought of Heraclitus. Plato’s framework was popularized by Christianity, which added egalitarian elements along with the virtue of pity. The maturation of Western metaphysics occurs during modernity’s scientific and political revolutions, wherein the effects of its inconsistencies, malfunctions, and mal-development become acute. At this point, according to Nietzsche, “the highest values devalue themselves,” as modernity’s striving for honesty, probity, and courage in the search for truth, those all-important virtues inhabiting the core of scientific progress, strike a fatal blow against the foundational idea of absolutes. Values most responsible for the scientific revolution, however, are also crucial to the metaphysical system that modern science is destroying. Such values are threatening, then, to bring about the destruction of their own foundations. Thus, the highest values are devaluing themselves at the core. Most importantly, the values of honesty, probity, and courage in the search for truth no longer seem compatible with the guarantee, the bestowal, and the bestowing agent of an absolute value. Even the truth of “truth” now falls prey to the workings of nihilism, given that Western metaphysics now appears groundless in this logic.

For some commentators, this line of interpretation leaves Nietzsche’s revaluation of values lost in contradiction. What philosophical ground, after all, could support revaluation if this interpretation were accurate? For this reason, readers such as Clark work to establish a coherent theory of truth in Nietzsche’s philosophy, which can apparently be done by emphasizing various parts of the corpus to the exclusion of others. If, indeed, a workable epistemology may be derived from reading specific passages, and good reasons can be given for prioritizing those passages, then consistent grounds may exist for Nietzsche having leveled a critique of morality. Such readings, however, seem incompatible with Nietzsche’s encounter with historical nihilism, unless nihilism is taken to represent merely a temporary stage in the refinement of Western humanity’s acquisition of knowledge.

With the stronger claim, however, Nietzsche’s critique of the modern situation implies that the “highest values [necessarily] devalue themselves.” Western metaphysics brings about its own disintegration, in working out the implications of its inner logic. Nietzsche’s name for this great and terrible event, capturing popular imagination with horror and disgust, is the “death of God.” Nietzsche acknowledges that a widespread understanding of this event, the “great noon” at which all “shadows of God” will be washed out, is still to come. In Nietzsche’s day, the God of the old metaphysics is still worshiped, of course, and would be worshiped, he predicted, for years to come. But, Nietzsche insisted, in an intellectual climate that demands honesty in the search for truth and proof as a condition for belief, the absence of foundations has already been laid bare. The dawn of a new day had broken, and shadows now cast, though long, were receding by the minute.

The second part of the answer to the question concerning nihilism states that “the aim is lacking.” What does this mean? In Beyond Good and Evil Nietzsche claims that the logic of an existence lacking inherent meaning demands, from an organizational standpoint, a value-creating response, however weak this response might initially be in comparison to how its values are then taken when enforced by social institutions (aphorisms 20-23).  Surveys of various cultures show that humanity’s most indispensable creation, the affirmation of meaning and purpose, lies at the heart of all fundamental values. Nihilism stands not only for that apparently inevitable process by which the highest values devalue themselves. It also stands for that moment of recognition in which human existence appears, ultimately, to be in vain. Nietzsche’s surveys of cultures and their values, his cultural anthropologies, are typically reductive in the extreme, attempting to reach the most important sociopolitical questions as neatly and quickly as possible. Thus, when examining so-called Jewish, Oriental, Roman, or Medieval European cultures Nietzsche asks, “how was meaning and purpose proffered and secured here? How, and for how long, did the values here serve the living? What form of redemption was sought here, and was this form indicative of a healthy life? What may one learn about the creation of values by surveying such cultures?” This version of nihilism then means that absolute aims are lacking and that cultures naturally attempt to compensate for this absence with the creation of goals.

The third part of the answer to the question concerning nihilism states that “‘why?’ finds no answer.” Who is posing the question here? Emphasis is laid on the one who faces the problem of nihilism. The problem of value-positing concerns the one who posits values, and this one must be examined, along with a corresponding evaluation of relative strengths and weaknesses. When, indeed, “why?” finds no answer, nihilism is complete. The danger here is that the value-positing agent might become paralyzed, leaving the call of life’s most dreadful question unanswered. In regards to this danger, Nietzsche’s most important cultural anthropologies examined the Greeks from Homer to the age of tragedy and the “pre-Platonic” philosophers. Here was evidence, Nietzsche believed, that humanity could face the dreadful truth of existence without becoming paralyzed. At every turn, the moment in which the Greek world’s highest values devalued themselves, when an absolute aim was shown to be lacking, the question “why?’ nevertheless called forth an answer. The strength of Greek culture is evident in the gods, the tragic art, and the philosophical concepts and personalities created by the Greeks themselves. Comparing the creativity of the Greeks to the intellectual work of modernity, the tragic, affirmative thought of Heraclitus to the pessimism of Schopenhauer, Nietzsche highlights a number of qualitative differences. Both types are marked by the appearance of nihilism, having been drawn into the inevitable logic of value-positing and what it would seem to indicate. The Greek type nevertheless demonstrates the characteristics of strength by activating and re-intensifying the capacity to create, by overcoming paralysis, by willing a new truth, and by affirming the will. The other type displays a pessimism of weakness, passivity, and weariness—traits typified by Schopenhauer’s life-denying ethics of the will turning against itself. In Nietzsche’s 1888 retrospection on the Birth of Tragedy in Ecce Homo, we read that “Hellenism and Pessimism” would have made a more precise title for the first work, because Nietzsche claims to have attempted to demonstrate how

the Greeks got rid of pessimism—with what they overcame it….Precisely tragedy is the proof that the Greeks were no pessimists: Schopenhauer  blundered in this as he blundered in everything (“The Birth of Tragedy” in Ecce Homo section 1).

From Twilight of the Idols, also penned during that sublime year of 1888, Nietzsche writes that tragedy “has to be considered the decisive repudiation” of pessimism as Schopenhauer understood it:

affirmation of life, even in its strangest and sternest problems, the will to life rejoicing in its own inexhaustibility through the sacrifice of its highest types—that is what I called Dionysian….beyond [Aristotelian] pity and terror, to realize in oneself the eternal joy of becoming—that joy which also encompasses joy in destruction (“What I Owe the Ancients” 5).

Nietzsche concludes the above passage by claiming to be the “last disciple of the philosopher Dionysus” (which by this time in Nietzsche’s thought came to encompass the whole of that movement which formerly distinguished between Apollo and Dionysus). Simultaneously, Nietzsche declares himself, with great emphasis, to be the “teacher of the eternal recurrence.”

The work to overcome pessimism is tragic in a two-fold sense: it maintains a feeling for the absence of ground, while responding to this absence with the creation of something meaningful. This work is also unmodern, according to Nietzsche, since modernity either has yet to ask the question “why?,” in any profound sense or, in those cases where the question has been posed, it has yet to come up with a response. Hence, a pessimism of weakness and an incomplete form of nihilism prevail in the modern epoch. Redemption in this life is denied, while an uncompleted form of nihilism remains the fundamental condition of humanity. Although the logic of nihilism seems inevitable, given the absence of absolute purpose and meaning, “actively” confronting nihilism and completing our historical encounter with it will be a sign of good health and the “increased power of the spirit” (Will to Power aphorism 22). Thus far, however, modernity’s attempts to “escape nihilism” (in turning away) have only served to “make the problem more acute” (aphorism 28). Why, then, this failure? What does modernity lack?

5. The Human Exemplar

How and why do nihilism and the pessimism of weakness prevail in modernity? Again, from the notebook of 1887 (Will to Power, aphorism 27), we find two conditions for this situation:

1. the higher species is lacking, i.e., those whose inexhaustible fertility and power keep up the faith in man….[and] 2. the lower species (‘herd,’ ‘mass,’ ‘society,’) unlearns modesty and blows up its needs into cosmic and metaphysical values. In this way the whole of existence is vulgarized: insofar as the mass is dominant it bullies the exceptions, so they lose their faith in themselves and become nihilists.

With the fulfillment of “European nihilism” (which is no doubt, for Nietzsche, endemic throughout the Western world and anyplace touched by “modernity”), and the death of otherworldly hopes for redemption, Nietzsche imagines two possible responses:  the easy response, the way of the “herd” and “the last man,” or the difficult response, the way of the “exception,” and the Übermensch.

Ancillary to any discussion of the exception, per se, the compatibility of the Übermensch concept with other movements in Nietzsche’s thought, and even the significance that Nietzsche himself placed upon it, has been the subject of intense debate among Nietzsche scholars. The term’s appearance in Nietzsche’s corpus is limited primarily to Thus Spoke Zarathustra and works directly related to this text. Even here, moreover, the Übermensch is only briefly and very early announced in the narrative, albeit with a tremendous amount of fanfare, before fading from explicit consideration. In addition to these problems, there are debates concerning the basic nature of the Übermensch itself, whether “Über-” refers to a transitional movement or a transmogrified state of being, and whether Nietzsche envisioned the possibility of a community of Übermenschen, as opposed to a solitary figure among lesser types. So, what should be made of Nietzsche’s so-called “overman” (or even “superman”) called upon to arrive after the “death of God”?

Whatever else may be said about the Übermensch, Nietzsche clearly had in mind an exemplary figure and an exception among humans, one “whose inexhaustible fertility and power keep up the faith in man.” For some commentators, Nietzsche’s distinction between overman and the last man has political ramifications. The hope for an overman figure to appear would seem to be permissible for one individual, many, or even a social ideal, depending on the culture within which it appears. Modernity, in Nietzsche’s view, is in such a state of decadence that it would be fortunate, indeed, to see the emergence of even one such type, given that modern sociopolitical arrangements are more conducive to creating the egalitarian “last man” who “blinks” at expectations for rank, self-overcoming, and striving for greatness. The last men are “ the most harmful to the species because they preserve their existence as much at the expense of the truth as at the expense of the future” (“Why I am a Destiny” in Ecce Homo 1). Although Nietzsche never lays out a precise political program from these ideas, it is at least clear that theoretical justifications for complacency or passivity are antithetical to his philosophy. What, then, may be said about Nietzsche as political thinker?   Nietzsche’s political sympathies are definitely not democratic in any ordinary way of thinking about that sort of arrangement. Nor are they socialist or  Marxist.

Nietzsche’s political sympathies have been called “aristocratic,” which is accurate enough only if one does not confuse the term with European royalty, landed gentry, old money or the like and if one keeps in mind the original Greek meaning of the term, “aristos,” which meant “the good man, the man with power.” A certain ambiguity exists, for Nietzsche, in the term “good man.” On the one hand, the modern, egalitarian “good man,” the “last man,” expresses hostility for those types willing to impose measures of rank and who would dare to want greatness and to strive for it. Such hostilities are born out of ressentiment and inherited from Judeo-Christian moral value systems. (Beyond Good and Evil 257-260 and On the Genealogy of Morals essay 1). “Good” in this sense is opposed to “evil,” and the “good man” is the one whose values support the “herd” and whose condemnations are directed at those whose thoughts and actions might disrupt the complacent normalcy of modern life. On the other hand, the kind of “good man” who might overcome the weak pessimism of “herd morality,” the man of strength, a man to confront nihilism, and thus a true benefactor to humanity, would be decidedly “unmodern” and “out of season.” Only such a figure would “keep up the faith in man.” For these reasons, some commentators have found in Nietzsche an existentialist program for the heroic individual dissociated in varying degrees from political considerations. Such readings however ignore or discount Nietzsche’s interest in historical processes and the unavoidable inference that although Nietzsche’s anti-egalitarianism might lead to questionably “unmodern” political conclusions, hierarchy nevertheless implies association.

The distinction between the good man of active power and the other type also points to ambiguity in the concept of freedom. For the hopeless, human freedom is conceived negatively in the “freedom from” restraints, from higher expectations, measures of rank, and the striving for greatness. While the higher type, on the other hand, understands freedom positively in the “freedom for” achievement, for revaluations of values, overcoming nihilism, and self-mastery.

Nietzsche frequently points to such exceptions as they have appeared throughout history—Napoleon is one of his favorite examples. In modernity, the emergence of such figures seems possible only as an isolated event, as a flash of lightening from the dark cloud of humanity. Was there ever a culture, in contrast to modernity, which saw these sorts of higher types emerge in congress as a matter of expectation and design? Nietzsche’s early philological studies on the Greeks, such as Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, The Pre-Platonic Philosophers, “Homer on Competition,” and “The Greek State,” concur that, indeed, the ancient world before Plato produced many exemplary human beings, coming forth independently of each other but “hewn from the same stone,” made possible by the fertile cultural milieu, the social expectation of greatness, and opportunities to prove individual merit in various competitive arenas. Indeed, Greek athletic contests, festivals of music and tragedy, and political life reflected, in Nietzsche’s view, a general appreciation for competition, rank, ingenuity, and the dynamic variation of formal structures of all sorts. Such institutions thereby promoted the elevation of human exemplars. Again, the point must be stressed here that the historical accuracy of Nietzsche’s interpretation of the Greeks is no more relevant to his philosophical schemata than, for example, the actual signing of a material document is to a contractarian political theory. What is important for Nietzsche, throughout his career, is the quick evaluation of social order and heirarchies, made possible for the first time in the nineteenth century by the newly developed “historical sense” (BGE 224) through which Nietzsche draws sweeping conclusions regarding, for example, the characteristics of various moral and religious epochs (BGE 32 and 55), which are themselves pre-conditioned by the material origins of consciousness, from which a pre-human animal acquires the capacity (even the “right”) to make promises and develops into the “sovereign individual” who then bears responsibility for his or her actions and thoughts (GM II.2).

Like these rather ambitious conclusions, Nietzsche’s valorization of the Greeks is partly derived from empirical evidence and partly confected in myth, a methodological concoction that Nietzsche draws from his philological training. If the Greeks, as a different interpretation would have them, bear little resemblance to Nietzsche’s reading, such a difference would have little relevance to Nietzsche’s fundamental thoughts. Later Nietzsche is also clear that his descriptions of the Greeks should not be taken programmatically as a political vision for the future (see for example GS 340).

The “Greeks” are one of Nietzsche’s best exemplars of hope against a meaningless existence, hence his emphasis on the Greek world’s response to the “wisdom of Silenus” in Birth of Tragedy. (ch. 5). If the sovereign individual represents history’s “ripest fruit”, the most recent millennia have created, through rituals of revenge and punishment, a “bad conscience.” The human animal thereby internalizes material forces into feelings of guilt and duty, while externalizing a spirit thus created with hostility towards existence itself (GM II.21). Compared to this typically Christian manner of forming human experiences, the Greeks deified “the animal in man” and thereby kept “bad conscience at bay” (GM II.23).

In addition to exemplifying the Greeks in the early works, Nietzsche lionizes the “artist-genius” and the “sage;” during the middle period he writes confidently, at first, and then longingly about the “scientist,” the “philosopher of the future,” and the “free spirit;” Zarathustra’s decidedly sententious oratory heralds the coming of the Übermensch; the periods in which “revaluation” comes to the fore finds value in the destructive influences of the “madman,” the “immoralist,” the “buffoon,” and even the “criminal.” Finally, Nietzsche’s last works reflect upon his own image, as the “breaker of human history into two,” upon “Mr. Nietzsche,” the “anti-Christian,” the self-anointed clever writer of great books, the creator of Zarathustra, the embodiment of human destiny and humanity’s greatest benefactor: “only after me,” Nietzsche claims in Ecce Homo, “is it possible to hope again” (“Why I am a Destiny” 1). It should be cautioned that important differences exist in the way Nietzsche conceives of each of these various figures, differences that reflect the development of Nietzsche’s philosophical work throughout the periods of his life. For this reason, none of these exemplars should be confused for the others. The bombastic “Mr. Nietzsche” of Ecce Homo is no more the “Übermensch” of Thus Spoke Zarathustra, for example, than the “Zarathustra” character is a “pre-Platonic philosopher” or the alienated, cool, sober, and contemptuous “scientist” is a “tragic artist,” although these figures will frequently share characteristics. Yet, a survey of these exceptions shows that Nietzsche’s philosophy, in his own estimation, needs the apotheosis of a human exemplar, perhaps to keep the search for meaning and redemption from abdicating the earth in metaphysical retreat, perhaps to avert the exhaustion of human creativity, to reawaken the instincts, to inspire the striving for greatness, to remind us that “this has happened once and is therefore a possibility,” or perhaps simply to bestow the “honey offering” of a very useful piece of folly. This need explains the meaning of the parodic fourth book of Zarathustra, which opens with the title character reflecting on the whole of his teachings: “I am he…who once bade himself, and not in vain: ‘Become what you are!’” The subtitle of Nietzsche’s autobiographical Ecce Homo, “How One Becomes What One Is,” strikes a similar chord.

6. Will to Power

The exemplar expresses hope not granted from metaphysical illusions. After sharpening the critique of art and genius during the positivistic period, Nietzsche seems more cautious about heaping praise upon specific historical figures and types, but even when he could no longer find an ideal exception, he nevertheless deemed it requisite to fabricate one in myth. Whereas exceptional humans of the past belong to an exalted “republic of genius,” those of the future, those belonging to human destiny, embody humanity’s highest hopes. As a result of this development, some commentators will emphasize the “philosophy of the future” as one of Nietzsche’s most important ideas. Work pursued in service of the future constitutes for Nietzsche an earthly form of redemption. Yet, exemplars of type, whether in the form of isolated individuals like Napoleon, or of whole cultures like the Greeks, are not caught up in petty historical politics or similar mundane endeavors. According to Nietzsche in Twilight of the Idols, their regenerative powers are necessary for the work of interpreting the meaning and sequence of historical facts.

My Conception of the genius—Great men, like great epochs, are explosive material in whom tremendous energy has been accumulated; their prerequisite has always been, historically and psychologically, that a protracted assembling, accumulating, economizing and preserving has preceded them—that there has been no explosion for a long time. If the tension in the mass has grown too great the merest accidental stimulus suffices to call the “genius,” the “deed,” the great destiny, into the world. Of what account then are circumstances, the epoch, the Zeitgeist, public opinion!...Great human beings are necessary, the epoch in which they appear is accidental… (“Expeditions of an Untimely Man,” 44).

It is with this understanding of the “great man” that Nietzsche, in Ecce Homo, proclaims even himself a great man, “dynamite,”“breaking the history of humanity in two” (“Why I am a Destiny” 1 and 8). A human exemplar, interpreted affirmatively in service of a hopeful future, is a “great event” denoting qualitative differences amidst the play of historical determinations. Thus, it belongs, in this reading, to Nietzsche’s cosmological vision of an indifferent nature marked occasionally by the boundary-stones of noble and sometimes violent uprisings.

To what extent is Nietzsche entitled to such a vision? Unlike nihilism, pessimism, and the death of God, which are historically, scientifically, and sometimes logically derived, Nietzsche’s “yes-saying” concepts seem to be derived from intuition, although Nietzsche will frequently support even these great hopes with bits of inductive reasoning. Nietzsche attempts to describe the logical structure of great events, as if a critical understanding of them pertains to their recurrence in modernity: great men have a “historical and psychological prerequisite.” Historically, there must be a time of waiting and gathering energy, as we find, for example, in the opening scene of Zarathustra. The great man and the great deed belong to a human destiny, one that emerges in situations of crisis and severe want. Psychologically, they are the effects of human energy stored and kept dormant for long periods of time in dark clouds of indifference. Primal energy gathers to a point before a cataclysmic event, like a chemical reaction with an electrical charge, unleashes some decisive, episodic force on all humanity. From here, the logic unfolds categorically: all great events, having occurred, are possibilities. All possibilities become necessities, given an infinite amount of time. Perhaps understanding this logic marks a qualitative difference in the way existence is understood. Perhaps this qualitative difference will spark the revaluation of values. When a momentous event takes place, the exception bolts from the cloud of normalcy as a point of extreme difference. In such ways, using this difference as a reference, as a “boundary-stone” on the river of eternal becoming, the meaning of the past is once again determined and the course of the future is set for a while, at least until a coming epoch unleashes the next great transvaluative event. Conditions for the occurrence of such events, and for the event of grasping this logic itself, are conceptualized, cosmologically in this reading, under the appellation “will to power.”

Before developing this reading further, it should be noted some commentators argue that the cosmological interpretation of will to power makes too strong a claim and that the extent of will to power’s domain ought to be limited to what the idea might explain as a theory of moral psychology, as the principle of an anthropology regarding the natural history of morals, or as a response to evolutionary theories placed in the service of utility. Such commentators will maintain that Nietzsche either in no way intends to construct a new meta-theory, or if he does then such intentions are mistaken and in conflict with his more prescient insights. Indeed, much evidence exists to support each of these positions. As an enthusiastic reader of the French Moralists of the eighteenth century, Nietzsche held the view that all human actions are motivated by the desire “to increase the feeling of power” (GS 13). This view seems to make Nietzsche’s insights regarding moral psychology akin to psychological egoism and would thus make doubtful the popular notion that Nietzsche advocated something like an egoistic ethic. Nevertheless, with this bit of moral psychology, a debate exists among commentators concerning whether Nietzsche intends to make dubious morality per se or whether he merely endeavors to expose those life-denying ways of moralizing inherited from the beginning of Western thought. Nietzsche, at the very least, is not concerned with divining origins. He is interested, rather, in measuring the value of what is taken as true, if such a thing can be measured. For Nietzsche, a long, murky, and thereby misunderstood history has conditioned the human animal in response to physical, psychological, and social necessities (GM II) and in ways that have created additional needs, including primarily the need to believe in a purpose for its very existence (GS 1). This ultimate need may be uncritically engaged, as happens with the incomplete nihilism of those who wish to remain in the shadow of metaphysics and with the laisser aller of the last man who overcomes dogmatism by making humanity impotent (BGE 188). On the other hand, a critical engagement with history is attempted in Nietzsche’s genealogies, which may enlighten the historical consciousness with a sort of transparency regarding the drive for truth and its consequences for determining the human condition. In the more critical engagement, Nietzsche attempts to transform the need for truth and reconstitute the truth drive in ways that are already incredulous towards the dogmatizing tendency of philosophy and thus able to withstand the new suspicions (BGE 22 and 34). Thus, the philosophical exemplar of the future stands in contrast, once again, to the uncritical man of the nineteenth century whose hidden metaphysical principles of utility and comfort fail to complete the overcoming of nihilism (Ecce Homo, “Why I am a Destiny” 4). The question of whether Nietzsche’s transformation of physical and psychological need with a doctrine of the will to power, in making an affirmative principle out of one that has dissolved the highest principles hitherto, simply replaces one metaphysical doctrine with another, or even expresses completely all that has been implicit in metaphysics per se since its inception continues to draw the interest of Nietzsche commentators today. Perhaps the radicalization of will to power in this way amounts to no more than an account of this world to the exclusion of any other. At any rate, the exemplary type, the philosophy of the future, and will to power comprise aspects of Nietzsche’s affirmative thinking. When the egoist’s “I will” becomes transparent to itself a new beginning is thereby made possible. Nietzsche thus attempts to bring forward precisely that kind of affirmation which exists in and through its own essence, insofar as will to power as a principle of affirmation is made possible by its own destructive modalities which pulls back the curtain on metaphysical illusions and dogma founded on them.

The historical situation that conditions Nietzsche’s will to power involves not only the death of God and the reappearance of pessimism, but also the nineteenth century’s increased historical awareness, and with it the return of the ancient philosophical problem of emergence. How does the exceptional, for example, begin to take shape in the ordinary, or truth in untruth, reason in un-reason, social order and law in violence, a being in becoming? The variation and formal emergence of each of these states must, according to Nietzsche, be understood as a possibility only within a presumed sphere of associated events. One could thus also speak of the “emergence,” as part of this sphere, of a given form’s disintegration. Indeed, the new cosmology must account for such a fate. Most importantly, the new cosmology must grant meaning to this eternal recurrence of emergence and disintegration without, however, taking vengeance upon it. This is to say that in the teaching of such a worldview, the “innocence of becoming” must be restored.  The problem of emergence attracted Nietzsche’s interest in the earliest writings, but he apparently began to conceptualize it in published texts during the middle period, when his work freed itself from the early period’s “metaphysics of aesthetics.” The opening passage from 1878’s Human, All Too Human gives some indication of how Nietzsche’s thinking on this ancient problem begins to take shape:

Chemistry of concepts and feelings. In almost all respects, philosophical problems today are again formulated as they were two thousand years ago: how can something arise from its opposite….? Until now, metaphysical philosophy has overcome this difficulty by denying the origin of the one from the other, and by assuming for the more highly valued things some miraculous origin…. Historical philosophy, on the other hand, the very youngest of all philosophical methods, which can no longer be even conceived of as separate from the natural sciences, has determined in isolated cases (and will probably conclude in all of them) that they are not opposites, only exaggerated to be so by the metaphysical view….As historical philosophy explains it, there exists, strictly considered, neither a selfless act nor a completely disinterested observation: both are merely sublimations. In them the basic element appears to be virtually dispersed and proves to be present only to the most careful observer. (Human, All Too Human, 1)

It is telling that Human begins by alluding to the problem of “emergence” as it is brought to light again by the “historical philosophical method.” A decidedly un-scientific “metaphysical view,” by comparison, looks rather for miraculous origins in support of the highest values. Next, in an unexpected move, Nietzsche relates the general problem of emergence to two specific issues, one concerning morals (“selfless acts”) and the other, knowledge—which is taken to include judgment (“disinterested observations”): “in them the basic element appears to be virtually dispersed” and discernable “only to the most careful observer.”

The logical structure of emergence, here, appears to have been borrowed from Hegel and, to be sure, one could point to many Hegelian traces in Nietzsche’s thought. But previously in 1874’s “On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life,” from Untimely Meditations, Nietzsche had steadfastly refuted the dialectical logic of a “world historical process,” the Absolute Idea, and cunning reason. What, then, is “the basic element”, dispersed in morals and knowledge? How is it dispersed so that only the careful observer can detect it? The most decisive moment in Nietzsche’s development of a cosmology seems to have occurred when Nietzsche plumbed the surface of his early studies on the pathos and social construction of truth to discover a more prevalent feeling, one animating all socially relevant acts. In Book One of the The Gay Science (certainly one of the greatest works in whole corpus) Nietzsche, in the role of “careful observer,” identifies, with a bit of moral psychology, the one motive spurring all such acts:

On the doctrine of the feeling of power. Benefiting and hurting others are ways of exercising one’s power upon others: that is all one desires in such cases…. Whether benefiting or hurting others involves sacrifices for us does not affect the ultimate value of our actions. Even if we offer our lives, as martyrs do for their church, this is a sacrifice that is offered for our desire for power or for the purpose of preserving our feeling of power. Those who feel “I possess Truth”—how many possessions would they not abandon in order to save this feeling!...Certainly the state in which we hurt others is rarely as agreeable, in an unadulterated way, as that in which we benefit others; it is a sign that we are still lacking power, or it shows a sense of frustration in the face of this poverty….(aphorism 13).

The “ultimate value” of our actions, even concerning those intended to pursue or preserve “truth,” are not measured by the goodness we bring others, notwithstanding the fact that intentionally harmful acts will be indicative of a desperate want of power. Nietzsche, here, asserts the significance of enhancing the feeling of power, and with this aphorism from 1882 we are on the way to seeing how “the feeling of power” will replace, for Nietzsche, otherworldly measures of value, as we read in finalized form in the second aphorism of 1888’s The Anti-Christ:

What is good?—All that heightens the feeling of power, the will to power, power itself in man. What is bad?—All that proceeds from weakness.  What is happiness?—The feeling that power increases—that a resistance is overcome.

No otherworldly measures exist, for Nietzsche. Yet, one should not conclude from this absence of a transcendental measure that all expressions of power are qualitatively the same. Certainly, the possession of a Machiavellian virtù will find many natural advantages in this world, but Nietzsche locates the most important aspect of “overcoming resistance” in self-mastery and self-commanding. In Zarathustra’s chapter, “Of Self-Overcoming,” all living creatures are said to be obeying something, while “he who cannot obey himself will be commanded. That is the nature of living creatures.” It is important to note the disjunction: one may obey oneself or one may not. Either way, one will be commanded, but the difference is qualitative. Moreover, “commanding is more difficult than obeying” (BGE 188 repeats this theme). Hence, one will take the easier path, if unable to command, choosing instead to obey the directions of another. The exception, however, will command and obey the healthy and self-mastering demands of a willing self. But why, we might ask, are all living things beholden to such commanding and obeying? Where is the proof of necessity here? Zarathustra answers:

Listen to my teaching, you wisest men! Test in earnest whether I have crept into the heart of life itself and down to the roots of its heart! Where I found a living creature, there I found will to power; and even in the will of the servant, I found the will to be master (Z “Of the Self-Overcoming”).

Here, apparently, Nietzsche’s doctrine of the feeling of power has become more than an observation on the natural history and psychology of morals. The “teaching” reaches into the heart of life, and it says something absolute about obeying and commanding. But what is being obeyed, on the cosmological level, and what is being commanded? At this point, Zarathustra passes on a secret told to him by life itself: “behold [life says], I am that which must overcome itself again and again…And you too, enlightened man, are only a path and a footstep of my will: truly, my will to power walks with the feet of your will to truth.” We see here that a principle, will to power, is embodied by the human being’s will to truth, and we may imagine it taking other forms as well. Reflecting on this insight, for example, Zarathustra claims to have solved “the riddle of the hearts” of the creator of values: “you exert power with your values and doctrines of good and evil, you assessors of values….but a mightier power and a new overcoming grow from out of your values…” That mightier power growing in and through the embodiment and expression of human values is will to power.

It is important not to disassociate will to power, as a cosmology, from the human being’s drive to create values. To be sure, Nietzsche is still saying that the creation of values expresses a desire for power, and the first essay of 1887’s On the Genealogy of Morality returns to this simple formula. Here, Nietzsche appropriates a well-known element of Hegel’s Phenomenology, the structural movement of thought between basic types called “masters and slaves.” This appropriation has the affect of emphasizing the difference between Nietzsche’s own historical “genealogies” and that of Hegel’s “dialectic” (as is worked out in Deleuze’s study of Nietzsche). Master and slave moralities, the truths of which are confirmed independently by feelings that power has been increased, are expressions of the human being’s will to power in qualitatively different states of health. The former is a consequence of strength, cheerful optimism and naiveté, while the latter stems from impotency, pessimism, cunning and, most famously, ressentiment, the creative reaction of a “bad conscience” coming to form as it turns against itself in hatred. The venom of slave morality is thus directed outwardly in ressentiment and inwardly in bad conscience. Differing concepts of “good,” moreover, belong to master and slave value systems. Master morality complements its good with the designation, “bad,” understood to be associated with the one who is inferior, weak, and cowardly. For slave morality, on the other hand, the designation, “good” is itself the complement of “evil,” the primary understanding of value in this scheme, associated with the one possessing superior strength. Thus, the “good man” in the unalloyed form of “master morality” will be the “evil man,” the man against whom ressentiment is directed, in the purest form of “slave morality.” Nietzsche is careful to add, at least in Beyond Good and Evil, that all modern value systems are constituted by compounding, in varying degrees, these two basic elements. Only a “genealogical” study of how these modern systems came to form will uncover the qualitative strengths and weaknesses of any normative judgment.

The language and method of The Genealogy hearken back to The Gay Science’s “doctrine of the feeling of power.” But, as we have seen, in the period between 1882 and 1887, and from out of the psychological-historical description of morality, truth, and the feeling of power, Nietzsche has given agency to the willing as such that lives in and through the embrace of power, and he generalizes the willing agent in order to include “life” and “the world” and the principle therein by which entities emerge embodied. The ancient philosophical problem of emergence is resolved, in part, with the cosmology of a creative, self-grounding, self-generating, sustaining and enhancing will to power. Such willing, most importantly, commands, which at the same time is an obeying: difference emerges from out of indifference and overcomes it, at least for a while. Life, in this view, is essentially self-overcoming, a self-empowering power accomplishing more power to no other end. In a notebook entry from 1885, Will to Power’s aphorism 1067, Nietzsche’s cosmological intuitions take flight:

And do you know what “the world” is to me? Shall I show it to you in my mirror? This world: a monster of energy, without beginning, without end…as force throughout, as a play of forces and waves of forces…a sea of forces flowing and rushing together, eternally changing and eternally flooding back with tremendous years of recurrence…out of the play of contradictions back to the joy of concord, still blessing itself as that which must return eternally, as a becoming that knows no satiety, no disgust, no weariness; this my Dionysian world of the eternally self-creating, the eternally self-destroying, this mystery world of the two-fold voluptuous delight, my “beyond good and evil,” without goal, unless the joy of the circle is itself a goal….This world is the will to power—and nothing besides! And you yourselves are also this will to power—and nothing besides!

Nietzsche discovers, here, the words to articulate one of his most ambitious concepts. The will to power is now described in terms of eternal and world-encompassing creativity and destructiveness, thought over the expanse of “tremendous years” and in terms of “recurrence,” what Foucault has described as the “play of domination” (1971). In some respects Nietzsche has indeed rediscovered the temporal structure of Heraclitus’ child at play, arranging toys in fanciful constructions of what merely seems like everything great and noble, before tearing down this structure and building again on the precipice of a new mishap. To live in this manner, according to Nietzsche in The Gay Science, to affirm this kind of cosmology and its form of eternity, is to “live dangerously” and to “love fate” (amor fati).

In spite of the positivistic methodology of The Genealogy, beneath the surface of this natural history of morals, will to power pumps life into the heart of both master and slave conceptual frameworks. Moreover, will to power stands as a necessary condition for all value judgments. How, one might ask, are these cosmological intuitions derived? How is knowledge of both will to power and its eternally recurring play of creation and destruction grounded? If they are to be understood poetically, then the question “why?” is misplaced (Zarathustra, “Of Poets”). Logically, with respect to knowledge, Nietzsche insists that principles of perception and judgment evolve co-dependently with consciousness, in response to physical necessities. The self is organized and brought to stand within the body and by the stimuli received there. This means that all principles are transformations of stimuli and interpretations thereupon: truth is “a mobile army of metaphors” which the body forms before the mind begins to grasp. Let us beware, Nietzsche cautions, of saying that the world possesses any sort of order or coherence without these interpretations (GS 109), even to the extent that Nietzsche himself conceives will to power as the way of all things. If all principles are interpretive gestures, by the logic of Nietzsche’s new cosmology, the will to power must also be interpretive (BGE 22). One aspect of the absence of absolute order is that interpretive gestures are necessarily called-forth for the establishment of meaning. A critical requirement of this interpretive gesture becoming transparent is that the new interpretation must knowingly affirm that all principles are grounded in interpretation. According to Nietzsche, such reflexivity does not discredit his cosmology: “so much the better,” since will to power, through Nietzsche’s articulation, emerges as the thought that now dances playfully and lingers for a while in the midst of what Vattimo might call a “weakened” (and weakening) “ontology” of indifference. The human being is thereby “an experimental animal” (GM II). Its truths have the seductive power of the feminine (BGE 1); while Nietzsche’s grandest visions are oriented by the “experimental” or “tempter” god, the one later Nietzsche comes to identify with the name Dionysus (BGE 295).

The philosopher of the future will posses a level of critical awareness hitherto unimagined, given that his interpretive gestures will be recognized as such. Yet, a flourishing life will still demand, one might imagine, being able to suspend, hide, or forget—at the right moments—the creation of values, especially the highest values. Perhaps the cartoonish, bombastic language of The Genealogy’s master and slave morality, to point to an example, which was much more soberly discussed in the previous year’s Beyond Good and Evil, is employed esoterically by Nietzsche for the rhetorical effect of producing a grand and spectacular diversion, hiding the all-important creative gesture that brought forth the new cosmology as a supreme value: “This world is the will to power and nothing besides!—And you yourselves are also this will to power--and nothing besides!” With this teaching, Nietzsche leaves underdeveloped many obvious themes, such as how the world’s non-animate matter may (or may not) be involved with will to power or whether non-human life-forms take part fully and equally in the world’s movement of forces. To have a perspective, for Nietzsche, seems sufficient for participating in will to power, but does this mean that non-human animals, which certainly seem to have perspectives, and without question participate in the living of life, have the human being’s capacity (or any capacity for that matter) to command themselves? Or, do trees and other forms of vegetation? Apparently, they do not. Such problems involve, again, the question of freedom, which interests Nietzsche primarily in the positive form. Of more importance to Nietzsche is that which pertains solely to the human being’s marshalling of forces but, even here (or perhaps especially here), a hierarchy of differences may be discerned. Some human forms of participation in will to power are noble, others ignoble. But, concerning these sorts of activities, Nietzsche stresses in Beyond Good and Evil (aphorism 9) the difference between his own cosmology, which at times seems to re-establish the place of nobility in nature, and the “stoic” view, which asserts the oneness of humanity with divine nature:

“According to nature” you want to live? Oh you noble Stoics, what deceptive words these are! Imagine a being like nature, wasteful beyond measure, indifferent beyond measure, without purposes and consideration, without mercy and justice, fertile and desolate and uncertain at the same time; imagine indifference itself as a power—how could you live according to this indifference? Living—is that not precisely wanting to be other than this nature? Is not livingestimating, preferring, being unjust, being limited, wanting to be different? ….But this is an ancient, eternal story: what formerly happened with the Stoics still happens today, too, as soon as any philosophy begins to believe in itself. It always creates the world in its own image; it cannot do otherwise. Philosophy is this tyrannical drive itself; the most spiritual will to power, to the “creation of  the world,” to the causa prima.

Strauss claims that here Nietzsche is replacing “divine nature” and its egalitarian coherence with “noble nature” and its expression of hierarchies, the condition for which is difference, per se, emerging in nature from indifference (1983). Other commentators have suggested that Nietzsche, here, betrays all of philosophy, lacking any sense of decency with this daring expose—that what is left after the expression of such a forbidden truth is no recourse to meaning.

The most generalized form of the philosophical problem of emergence and disintegration, of the living, valuing, wanting to be different, willing power, is described here in terms of the difference-creating gesture embodied by the human being’s essential work, its “creation of the world” and first causes. Within nature, one might say, energy disperses and accumulates in various force-points: nature’s power to create these force-points is radically indifferent, and this indifference towards what has been created also characterizes its power. Periodically, something exceptional is thrust out from its opposite, given that radical indifference is indifferent even towards itself (if one could speak of ontological conditions in such a representative tone, which Nietzsche certainly does from time to time). Nature is disturbed, and the human being, having thus become aware of its own identity and of others, works towards preserving itself by tying things down with definitions; enhancing itself, occasionally, by loosening the fetters of old, worn-out forms; creating and destroying in such patterns, so as to make humanity and even nature appear to conform to some bit of tyranny. From within the logic of will to power, narrowly construed, human meaning is thus affirmed. “But to what end?” one might ask. To no end, Nietzsche would answer. Here, the more circumspect view could be taken, as is found in Twilight of the Idol’s “The Four Great Errors”: “One is a piece of fate, one belongs to the whole, one is in the whole, there exist nothing which could judge, measure, compare, condemn our being, for that would be to judge, measure, compare, condemn the whole….But nothing exists apart from the whole!” Nietzsche conceptualizes human fate, then, in his most extreme vision of will to power, as being fitted to a whole, “the world,” which is itself “nothing besides” a “monster of energy, without beginning, without end…eternally changing and eternally flooding back with tremendous years of recurrence.” In such manner, will to power expresses itself not only through the embodiment of humanity, its exemplars, and the constant revaluation of values, but also in time. Dasein, for Nietzsche, is suspended on the cross between these ontological movements—between an in/different playing of destruction/creation—and time. But, what temporal model yields the possibility for these expressions? How does Nietzsche’s experimental philosophy conceptualize time?

7. Eternal Recurrence

The world’s eternally self-creating, self-destroying play is conditioned by time. Yet, Nietzsche’s skepticism concerning what can be known of telos, indeed his refutation of an absolute telos independent of human fabrication, demands a view of time that differs from those that place willing, purposiveness, and efficient causes in the service of goals, sufficient reason, and causa prima. Another formulation of this problem might ask, “what is the history of willing, if not the demonstration of progress and/or decay?”

Nietzsche’s solution to the riddle of time, nevertheless, radicalizes the Christian concept of eternity, combining a bit of simple observation and sure reasoning with an intuition that produces curious, but innovative results. The solution takes shape as Nietzsche fills the temporal horizons of past and future with events whose denotations have no permanent tether. Will to power, the Heraclitean cosmic-child, plays-on without preference to outcomes. Within the two-fold limit of this horizon, disturbances emerge from their opposites, but one cannot evaluate them, absolutely, because judgment implicates participation in will to power, in the ebb and flow of events constituting time. The objective perspective is not possible, since the whole consumes all possibilities, giving form to and destroying all that has come to fulfillment. Whatever stands in this flux, does so in the midst of the whole, but only for a while. It disturbs the whole, but does so as part of the whole. As such, whatever stands is measured, on the one hand, by the context its emergence creates. On the other hand, whatever stands is immeasurable, by virtue of the whole, the logic of which would determine this moment to have occurred in the never-ending flux of creation and destruction. Even to say that particular events seem better or worse suited to the functionality of the whole, or to its stability, or its health, or that an event may be measured absolutely by its fitted-ness in some other way, presupposes a standpoint that Nietzsche’s cosmology will not allow. One is left only to describe material occurrences and to intuit the passing of time.

The second part of Nietzsche’s solution to the riddle of time reasons that the mere observation of an occurrence, whether thought to be a simple thing or a more complex event, is enough to demonstrate the occurrence’s possibility. If “something” has happened, then its happening, naturally, must have been possible. Each simple thing or complex event is linked, inextricably, to a near infinite number of others, also demonstrating the possibilities of their happenings. If all of these possibilities could be presented in such a way as to account for their relationships and probabilities, as for example on a marvelously complex set of dice, then it could be shown that each of these possibilities will necessarily occur, and re-occur, given that the game of dice continues a sufficient length of time.

Next, Nietzsche considers the nature of temporal limits and duration. He proposes that no beginning or end of time can be determined, absolutely, in thought. No matter what sort of temporal limits are set by the imagination, questions concerning what lies beyond these limits never demonstrably cease. The question, “what precedes or follows the imagined limits of past and future?” never contradicts our understanding of time, which is thus shown to be more culturally and historically determined than otherwise admitted.

Finally, rather than to imagine a past and future extended infinitely on a plane of sequential moments, or to imagine a time in which nothing happens or will happen, Nietzsche envisions connecting what lies beyond the imagination’s two temporal horizons, so that time is represented in the image of a circle, through which a colossal, but definitive number of possibilities are expressed. Time is infinite with this model, but filled by a finite number of material possibilities, recurring eternally in the never-ending play of the great cosmic game of chance.

What intuition led Nietzsche to interpret the cosmos as having no inherent meaning, as if it were playing itself out and repeating itself in eternally recurring cycles, in the endless creation and destruction of force-points without purpose? How does this curious temporal model relate to the living of life?  In his philosophical autobiography, Ecce Homo, Nietzsche grounds eternal recurrence in his own experiences by relating an anecdote regarding, supposedly, its first appearance to him in thought. One day, Nietzsche writes, while hiking around Lake Silvaplana near Sils Maria, he came upon a giant boulder, took out a piece of paper and scribbled, “6000 Fuss jenseits von Mensch und Zeit.” From here, Nietzsche goes on to articulate “the eternal recurrence of the same,” which he then characterizes as “a doctrine” or “a teaching” of the “highest form of affirmation that can possibly be attained.”

It is important to note that at the time of this discovery, Nietzsche was bringing his work on The Gay Science to a close and beginning to sketch out a plan for Zarathustra. The conceptualization of eternal recurrence emerges at the threshold of Nietzsche’s most acute positivistic inquiry and his most poetic creation. The transition between the two texts is made explicit when Nietzsche repeats the final aphorism of The Gay Science’s Book IV in the opening scene of Zarathustra’s prelude. The repetition of this scene will prove to be no coincidence, given the importance Nietzsche places upon the theme of recurrence in Zarathustra’s climactic chapters. Moreover, in the penultimate aphorism of The Gay Science, as a sort of introduction to that text’s Zarathustra scene (which itself would seem quite odd apart from the later work), Nietzsche first lays out Zarathustra’s central teaching, the idea of eternal recurrence.

The greatest weight.—What, if some day or night a demon were to steal after you into your loneliest loneliness and say to you: “This life as you now live it and have lived it, you will have to live once more and innumerable times more; and there will be nothing new in it, but every pain and every joy and every thought and sigh and everything unutterably small or great in your life will have to return to you, all in the same succession and sequence—even this spider and this moonlight between the trees, and even this moment and I myself. The eternal hourglass of existence is turned upside down again and again, and you with it, speck of dust!” (GS 341).

“What if,” wonders Nietzsche, the thought took hold of us? Here, the conceptualization of eternal recurrence, thus, coincides with questions regarding its impact: “how well disposed would you have to become to yourself and to life to crave nothing more fervently than this ultimate eternal confirmation and seal?”

How would the logic of this new temporal model alter our experiences of factual life? Would such a thought diminish the willfulness of those who grasp it? Would it diminish our willingness to make normative decisions? Would willing cease under the pessimistic suspicion that the course for everything has already been determined, that all intentions are “in vain”? What would we lose by accepting the doctrine of this teaching? What would we gain? It seems strange that Nietzsche would place so much dramatic emphasis on this temporal form of determinism. If all of our worldly strivings and cravings were revealed, in the logic of eternal recurrence, to be no more than illusions, if every contingent fact of creation and destruction were understood to have merely repeated itself without end, if everything that happens, as it happens, both re-inscribes and anticipates its own eternal recurrence, what would be the affect on our dispositions, on our capacities to strive and create? Would we be crushed by this eternal comedy? Or, could we somehow find it liberating?

Even though Nietzsche has envisioned a temporal model of existence seemingly depriving us of the freedom to act in unique ways, we should not fail to catch sight of the qualitative differences the doctrine nevertheless leaves open for the living. The logic of eternity determines every contingent fact in each cycle of recurrence. That is, each recurrence is quantitatively the same. The quality of that recurrence, however, seems to remain an open question. What if the thought took hold of us? If we indeed understood ourselves to be bound by fate and thus having no freedom from the eternal logic of things, could we yet summon love for that fate, to embrace a kind of freedom for becoming that person we are? This is the strange confluence of possibility and necessity that Nietzsche announces in the beginning of Gay Science’s Book IV, with the concept of Amor fati: “I want to learn more and more to see as beautiful what is necessary in things; then I shall be one of those who make things beautiful. Amor fati: let that be my love henceforth!”

Responses to this “doctrine” have been varied. Even some of the most enthusiastic Nietzsche commentators have, like Kaufmann, deemed it unworthy of serious reflection. Nietzsche, however, appears to stress its significance in Twilight of the Idols and Ecce Homo by emphasizing Zarathustra’s importance in the “history of humanity” and by dramatically staging in Thus Spoke Zarathustra the idea of eternal recurrence as the fundamental teaching of the main character. The presentation of this idea, however, leaves room for much doubt concerning the literal meaning of these claims, as does the paucity of direct references to the doctrine in other works intended for publication. In Nietzsche’s Nachlass, we discover attempts to work out rational proofs supporting the theory, but they seem to present no serious challenge to a linear conception of time. Among commentators taking the doctrine seriously, Löwith takes it as a supplement to Nietzsche’s historical nihilism, as a way of placing emphasis on the problem of meaning in history after the shadows of God have been dissolved. For Löwith’s Nietzsche, nihilism is more than an historical moment giving rise to a crisis of confidence or faith. Rather, nihilism is the essence of Nietzsche’s thought, and it poses the sorts of problems that lead Nietzsche into formulating eternal return as a way of restoring meaning in history. For Löwith, then, eternal return is inextricably linked to historical nihilism and offers both cosmological and anthropological grounds for accepting imperatives of self-overcoming. Yet, this grand attempt fails to restore meaning after the death of God, according to Löwith, because of eternal return’s logical contradictions.

8. Reception of Nietzsche’s Thought

The reception of Nietzsche’s work, on all levels of engagement, has been complicated by historical contingencies that are related only by accident to the thought itself. The first of these complications pertains to the editorial control gained by Elizabeth in the aftermath of her brother’s mental and physical collapse. Elisabeth’s overall impact on her brother’s reputation is generally thought to be very problematic. Her husband, Bernhard Förster, whom Friedrich detested, was a leader of the late nineteenth-century German anti-Semitic political movement, which Friedrich often ridiculed and unambiguously condemned, both in his published works and in private correspondences. On this issue, Yovel demonstrates persuasively, with a contextual analysis of letters, materials from the Nachlass, and published works, that Nietzsche developed an attitude of “anti-anti-Semitism” after overcoming the culture of prejudice that formed him in his youth (Yovel, 1998). In the mid-1880s, Förster and wife led a small group of colonists to Paraguay in hopes of establishing an idyllic, racially pure, German settlement. The colony foundered, Bernhard committed suicide, and Elisabeth returned home, just in time to find her brother’s health failing and his literary career ready to soar.

Upon her return, Elisabeth devised a way to keep alive the memory of both husband and brother, legally changing her last name to “Förster-Nietzsche,” a gesture indicative of designs to associate the philosopher with a political ideology he loathed. The stain of Elisabeth’s editorial imprint can be seen on the many ill-informed and haphazard interpretations of Nietzsche produced in the early part of the twentieth century, the unfortunate traces of which remain in some readings today. During the 1930s, in the midst of intense activity by National Socialist academic propagandists such as Alfred Bäumler, even typically insightful thinkers such as Emmanuel Levinas confused the public image of Nietzsche for the philosopher’s stated beliefs. Counter-efforts in the 1930s to refute such propaganda, and the popular misconceptions it was fomenting at the time, can be found both inside and outside Germany, in seminars, for example, led by Karl Jaspers and Karl Löwith, and in Georges Bataille’s essay “Nietzsche and the Fascists.” Of course, the ad hominem argument that “Nietzsche must be a Fascist philosopher because the Fascists venerated him as one of their own,” may be ignored. (No one should find Kant’s moral philosophy reprehensible, by comparison, simply on the grounds that Eichmann attempted to exploit it in a Jerusalem court). Apart from the fallacy, here, even the premise itself regarding Nietzsche and the Fascists is not entirely above reproach, since some Fascists were skeptical of the commensurability of Nietzsche’s thought with their political aims. The stronger claim that Nietzsche’s thought leads to National Socialism is even more problematic. Nevertheless, intellectual histories pursuing the question of how Nietzsche has been placed into the service of all sorts of political interests are an important part of Nietzsche scholarship.

Since the middle part of the last century, Nietzsche scholars have come to grips with the role played by Elisabeth and her associates in obscuring Nietzsche’s anti-Nationalistic, anti-Socialist, anti-German views, his pan-European advocacy of race mixing, as well as his hatred for anti-Semitism and its place in the late-nineteenth-century politics of exploitation. The work Elisabeth performed as her brother’s publicist, however, undoubtedly fulfilled all of her own fantasies: in the early 1930’s, decades after Friedrich’s death, the Nietzsche-Archiv was visited, ceremoniously, by Adolf Hitler, who was greeted and entertained by Elisabeth (in perhaps the most symbolic gesture of her association with the Nietzsche image) with a public reading of the work of her late husband, Bernhard, the anti-Semite. Hitler later attended Elisabeth’s funeral as Chancellor of Germany.

In a matter related to Elizabeth’s impact on the reception of her brother’s thought, the relevance of Nietzsche’s biography to his philosophical work has long been a point of contention among Nietzsche commentators. While an exhaustive survey of the way this key issue has been addressed in the scholarship would be difficult in this context, a few influential readings may be briefly mentioned. Among notable German readers, Heidegger and Fink dismiss the idea that Nietzsche’s thought can be elucidated with the details of his life, while Jaspers affirms the “exceptional” nature of Nietzsche’s life and identifies the exception as a key aspect of his philosophy. French readers such as Bataille, Deleuze, Klossowski, Foucault, and Derrida assert the relevance of various biographical details to specific movements within Nietzsche’s writings. In the United States, the influential reading of Walter Kaufman follows Heidegger, for the most part, in denying relevance, while his student, Alexander Nehamas, tends the other way, linking Nietzsche’s various literary styles to his “perspectivism” and ultimately to living, per se, as an self-interpretive gesture. However difficult it might be to see the philosophical relevance of various biographical curiosities, such as Nietzsche’s psychological development as a child without a living father, his fascination and then fallout with Wagner, his professional ostracism, his thwarted love life, the excruciating physical ailments that tormented him, and so on, it would also seem capricious and otherwise inconsistent with Nietzsche’s work to radically severe his thought from these and other biographical details, and persuasive interpretations have argued that such experiences, and Nietzsche’s well-considered views of them, are inseparable from the multiple trajectories of his intellectual work.

Attempts to isolate Nietzsche’s philosophy from the twists and turns of a frequently problematic life may be explained, in part, as a reaction to several early, and rather detrimental, popular-psychological studies attempting to explain the work in a reductive and decidedly un-philosophical manner. Such was the reading proffered, for example, by Lou Salomè, a woman with whom Nietzsche briefly had an unconventional and famously complex romantic relationship, and who later befriended Sigmund Freud among other leaders of European culture at the fin-de-siècle. Salomè’s Friedrich Nietzsche in His Works (1894) helped cast the image of Nietzsche as a lonely, miserable, self-immolating, recluse whose “external intellectual work…and inner life coalesce completely.” In some commentaries, this image prevails yet today, but its accuracy is also a matter of debate. Nietzsche had many casual associates and a few close friends while in school and as a professor in Basel. Even during the period of his most intense intellectual activity, after withdrawing from the professional world of the academy and, like Marx and others before him in the nineteenth century, taking up the wandering life of a “good European,” the many written correspondences between Nietzsche and life-long friends, along with what is known about the minor details of his daily habits, his days spent in the company of fellow lodgers and travelers, taking meals regularly (in spite of a very closely regulated diet), and similar anecdotes, all put forward a different image. No doubt the affair with Salomè and their mutual friend, the philosopher Paul Rée, left Nietzsche embittered towards the two of them, and it seems likely that this bitterness clouded Salomè’s interpretation of Nietzsche and his works. Elisabeth, who had always loathed Salomè for her immoderation and perceived influence over Friedrich, attempted to correct her rival’s account by writing her own biography of Friedrich, which was effusive in its praise but did little to advance the understanding of Nietzsche’s thought. Perhaps these kinds of problems, then, provide the best argument for resisting the lure to reduce interpretations of Nietzsche’s thought to gossipy biographical anecdotes and clumsy, amateurish speculation, even if the other extreme has also been excessive at times.

Another key issue in the reception of Nietzsche’s work involves determining its relationship to the thoughts of other philosophers and, indeed, to the philosophical tradition itself. On both levels of this complex issue, the work of Martin Heidegger looms paramount. Heidegger began working closely with Nietzsche’s thought in the 1930s, a time rife with political opportunism in Germany, even among scholars and intellectuals. In the midst of a struggle over the official Nazi interpretation of Nietzsche, Heidegger’s views began to coalesce, and after a series of lectures on Nietzsche’s thought in the late 1930’s and 1940, Heidegger produces in 1943 the seminal essay, “Nietzsche’s Word: “God is Dead””.  Nietzsche, for Heidegger, brought “the consummation of metaphysics” in the age of subject-centered reasoning, industrialization, technological power, and the “enframing” (Ge-stell) of humans and all other beings as a “standing reserve.” Combining Nietzsche’s self-described “inversion of Platonism” with the emphasis Nietzsche had undoubtedly placed upon the value-positing act and its relatedness to subjective or inter-subjective human perspectives, Heidegger dubbed Nietzsche “the last metaphysician” and tied him to the logic of a historical narrative highlighted by the appearances of Plato, Aristotle, Roman Antiquity, Christendom, Luther, Descartes, Leibniz, Schopenhauer, and others. The “one thought” common to each of these movements and thinkers, according to Heidegger, and the path Nietzsche thus thinks through to its “consummation,” is the “metaphysical” determination of being (Sein) as no more than something static and constantly present. Although Nietzsche appears to reject the concept of being as an “empty fiction” (claiming, in Twilight of the Idols, to concur with Heraclitus in this regard), Heidegger nevertheless reads in Nietzsche’s Platonic inversion the most insidious form of the metaphysics of presence, in which the destruction and re-establishment of value is taken to be the only possible occasion for philosophical labor whereby the very question of being is completely obliterated. Within this diminution of thought, the Nietzschean “Superman” emerges supremely powerful and triumphant, taking dominion over the earth and all of its beings, measured only by the mundane search for advantages in the ubiquitous struggle for preservation and enhancement.

As is typically the case with Heidegger’s interpretations of the history of philosophy, many aspects of this reading are truly remarkable—Heidegger’s scholarship, for example, his feel for what is important to Nietzsche, and his elaboration of Nietzsche’s work in a way that seems compatible with a narrative of the concealing and revealing destiny of being. However, the plausibility of this reading has come into question almost from the moment the full extent of it was made known in the 1950s and 60s. In Germany, for example, Eugen Fink concludes his 1960 study of Nietzsche by casting doubt upon Heidegger’s claim that Nietzsche’s thought can be reduced to a metaphysics:

Heidegger’s Nietzsche interpretation is essentially based upon  Heidegger’s summary and insight into the history of being and in particular on his interpretation of the metaphysics of modernity. Nevertheless, the question remains open whether Nietzsche does not already leave the metaphysical dimensions of any problems essentially and intentionally behind in his conception of the cosmos. There is a non-metaphysical originality in his cosmological philosophy of “play.” Even the early writings indicate the mysterious dimension of play….

Fink’s reluctance to take a stronger position against the reading of his renowned teacher seems rather coy, given that Fink’s study, throughout, has stressed the meaning and importance of “cosmological play” in Nietzsche’s work. Other commentators have much more explicitly challenged Heidegger’s grand narrative and specifically its place for Nietzsche in the Western tradition, concurring with Fink that Nietzsche’s conceptualization of play frees his thought from the tradition of metaphysics, or that Nietzsche, purposively or not, offered conflicting views of himself, eluding the kind of summary treatment presented by Heidegger and much less-gifted readers (who consider Nietzsche to be no more than a late-Romantic, a social-Darwinist, or the like). In this sort of commentary, Nietzsche’s work itself is at play in deconstructing the all-too-rigid kinds of explanations.

While such a reading has proven to be popular, partly because it seems to make room for various points of entry into Nietzsche’s thought, it has understandably stirred a backlash of sorts among less charitable commentators who find pragmatic or neo-Kantian strains in Nietzsche’s critique of metaphysics and who wish to separate Nietzsche’s level-headed philosophy from his poorly-developed musings. Notable works by Schacht, Clark, Conway, and Leiter fall into this category. In a loosely related movement, many commentators bring Nietzsche into dialogue with the tradition by concentrating on aspects of his work relevant to particular philosophical issues, such as the problem of truth, the development of a natural history of morals, a philosophical consideration of moral psychology, problems concerning subjectivity and logo-centrism, theories of language, and many others. Finally, much work continues to be done on Nietzsche in the history of ideas, regarding, for example, Nietzsche’s philology, his intellectual encounters with nineteenth-century science; the neo-Kantians; the pre-Socratics (or “pre-Platonics,” as he called them); the work of his friend, Paul Rée; their shared affinity for the wit and style of La Rochefoucauld; historical affinities and influences such as those pertaining to Hölderlin, Goethe, Emerson, and Lange, detailed studies of what Nietzsche was reading and when he was reading it, and a host of other themes. Works by Habermas, Porter, Gillespie, Brobjer, Ansell-Pearson, Conway, and Strong are notable for historicizing Nietzsche in a variety of contexts.

The Anglo-American reception of Nietzsche is typically suspicious of Heidegger’s influence and strongly disapproves of gestures linking the “New Nietzsche” found in late twentieth-century discussions of postmodernism and literary criticism to a supposed end of philosophy, although some American scholars will admit, with Gillespie, that “the core of this postmodern reading cannot simply be dismissed,” despite this reading’s excesses (1995, 177). Due to these suspicions, moreover, common Nietzschean themes such as historical nihilism, Dionysianism, tragedy, and play, as well as cosmological readings of will to power, and eternal recurrence are downplayed in Anglo-American treatments, in favor of bringing out more traditional sorts of philosophical problems such as truth and knowledge, values and morality, and human consciousness. Nietzsche reception in the United States has been determined by a unique set of circumstances, as portrayed by Schacht (1995) and others. A very early stage of that reception is stained by the Nazi-misappropriation of Nietzsche, which popular American audiences were prepared to accept uncritically due on the one hand to their initial impression of Nietzsche as an enemy of Christianity who ultimately went insane and on the other hand to their lack of familiarity with Nietzsche’s work. The next stage of Nietzsche reception in the U.S. benefited greatly from Walter Kaufmann’s landmark treatment in the 1950’s. Kaufmann’s Nietzsche was certainly no fascist. Rather, he was a secular humanist and a forerunner of the existentialist movement enjoying a measure of popularity (and acceptability) on college campuses in the United States during the 1950’s and 1960’s. Whereas European commentators such as Jaspers, Löwith, Bataille, and even Heidegger had been busy in the 1930’s “marshalling” Nietzsche (as Jaspers described it) against the National Socialists, in the U.S. it was left to Kaufmann and others in the 1950’s to successfully refute the image of Nietzsche as a Nazi-prototype. So successful was Kaufmann in this regard, that Anglo-American readers had difficulty seeing Nietzsche in any other light, and philosophers who found existentialism shallow regarded Nietzsche with the same disdain. This image of Nietzsche was corrected, somewhat, by Danto’s Nietzsche as Philosopher, which attempted to cast Nietzsche as a forerunner to analytic philosophy, although doubts about Nietzsche’s suitability for this role surely remain even today. To the extent that Danto succeeded in the 1970’s in reshaping philosophical discussions regarding Nietzsche, a new difficulty emerged, related generally to a tension in the world of Anglo-American philosophy between Analytic and Continental approaches to the discipline. In such a light, Schacht sees his work on Nietzsche as an attempt to bridge this institutional divide, as do other Anglo-American readers. The work of Rorty may certainly be characterized in this manner. Despite these attempts, tensions remain between Anglo-American readers who cultivate a neo-pragmatic version of Nietzsche and those who, by comparison, seem too comfortable accepting uncritically the problematic aspects of the Continental interpretation.

In most cases, interpretations of Nietzsche’s thought, and what is taken to be most significant about it, when not directed solely by external considerations, will be determined by the texts in Nietzsche’s corpus given priority and by a decision regarding Nietzsche’s overall coherence, as concerns any given issue, throughout the trajectory of his intellectual development.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Nietzsche’s Collected Works in German

  • Samtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, 15 vols (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1980).
    • This “critical student edition” of collected works, commonly referenced as the KSA, contains Nietzsche’s major writings and most of the well-known essays and aphorisms found in his journals. Specialists and readers seeking Nietzsche’s letters, his lectures at Basel, and other writings from his vast Nachlass, will need to supplement the KSA with two additional sources.
  • Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Briefwechsel, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, 24 vols. (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1975-84).
    • This edition offers a comprehensive collection of Nietzsche’s correspondences.
  • Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1967-).
    • The project of publishing a “complete edition” of Nietzsche’s writings was started in 1967 by Colli and Montinari and has since enlisted the services of a number of other editors. At the present time, the project remains unfinished. The most important contribution of the KGW, as this edition is commonly referenced, is perhaps its publication of Nietzsche’s lectures from the University of Basel on topics such as pre-Platonic philosophy, the Platonic dialogues, and ancient rhetoric.

b. Nietzsche’s Major Works Available in English

Most of Nietzsche’s major works were published during his lifetime and are now available to English readers in competing translations. The following list is by no means exhaustive.

  • The Birth of Tragedy (Die Geburt der Tragödie,1872); published in English with The Case of Wagner (Der Fall Wagner, 1888), trans. Walter Kaufmann, (New York: Vintage, 1966).
    • These two texts are available separately in other editions
  • Untimely Meditations (Unzeitgemässe Betrachtungen, 1873-1876), trans. R.J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983).
    • The four essays of this work are available separately in other editions
  • Human, All Too Human (Menschliches, Allzumenschliches [vol. 1], 1878 and [vol. 2], 1879-1880), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986).
    • Volume one of this work and the two distinct parts of volume two, “Assorted Maxims and Aphorisms” and “The Wanderer and His Shadow,” are available separately in other editions.
  • Daybreak (Morgenröte, 1881), trans. R, J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
    • The later editions of this translation contain a helpful index.
  • The Gay Science (Die fröliche Wissenschaft, 1882; with important supplements to the second edition, 1887), trans. Walter Kaufman (New York: Vintage, 1974).
  • Thus Spoke Zarathustra (Also Sprach Zarathustra, bks I-II, 1883; bk III, 1884; bk IV [printed and distributed privately], 1885), trans. R. J. Hollingdale, (New York: Penguin, 1973).
  • Beyond Good and Evil (Jenseits von Gut und Böse, 1886), trans. Walter Kaufman (New York: Vintage, 1966).
  • On the Genealogy of Morality (Zur Genealogie der Moral, 1887), edited with important supplements from the Nachlass and other works by Keith Ansell-Pearson; trans. Carol Diethe (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995).
  • The Case of Wagner (Der Fall Wagner, 1888); published in English with The Birth of Tragedy (Die Geburt der Tragödie,1872), trans. Walter Kaufmann, (New York: Vintage, 1966)
  • Ecce Homo (Ecce Homo, 1888, first published 1908), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Penguin, 1992).
  • Nietzsche contra Wagner (Nietzsche contra Wagner, 1888, first published 1895), trans. Walter Kaufmann, in The Portable Nietzsche, ed. Walter Kaufmann (New York: Viking, 1954).
  • Twilight of the Idols (Götzen-Dämmerung, 1889); published in English with The Anti-Christ (Der Antichrist, 1888), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Penguin, 1968).

c. Important Works Available in English from Nietzsche’s Nachlass

Nietzsche’s Nachlass contains several developed essays and an overwhelming number of fragments, sketches of outlines, and aphorisms, some in thematically related successions. A number of these writings are available to English readers, and a few are accessible in a variety of editions, either as supplements to the major works or as part of assorted critical editions. The following list offers a sample of these writings.

  • “Homer on Competition” (“Homers Wettkampf,” 1872) and “The Greek State” (Der griechische Staat, 1872), included in On the Genealogy of Morality (Zur Genealogie der Moral, 1887), ed. Keith Ansell-Pearson; trans. Carol Diethe (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995).
  • “On Truth and Lies in a Nonmoral Sense” (“Über Wahrheit und Lüge im aussermoralischen Sinne,” 1873), collected in various editions, including Philosophy and Truth: Selections from Nietzsche’s Notebooks of the early 1870’s, ed. and trans. Daniel Breazeale (New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1979) and Friedrich Nietzsche on Rhetoric and Language, ed. and trans. Sander L. Gilman, Carole Blair, and David J. Parent (New York: Oxford University Press, 1989).
  • Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (Die Philosophie im tragischen Zeitalter der Griechen, 1873), trans. Marianne Cowan (Washington, D. C.: Gateway Editions, 1962).
  • The Pre-Platonic Philosophers (Die vorplatonischen Philosophen, lectures during various semesters at Basel from 1869 to 1876; ed. by Fritz Bornmann and Mario Carpitella for the KGW, vol. II, part 4), ed. and trans. with an interpretive essay and appendix by Greg Whitlock (Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2001).
  • Unpublished Writings from the Period of Unfashionable Observations (vol. 11 of The Completed Works of Friedrich Nietzsche), based on the KGW, adapted by Ernst Behler; ed. Bernd Magnus; trans. Richard T. Gray (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1999).
  • The Will to Power (Der Wille zur Macht, writings from the Nachlass ed. and arranged by Elizabeth Förster-Nietzsche and Peter Gast and published in various forms after Nietzsche’s death), trans. Walter Kaufmann and R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Vintage, 1967).
  • Writings from the Late Notebooks (writings from the Nachlass), ed. Rüdigger Bittner; trans. Kate Sturge (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).

d. Biographies

A firsthand and secondhand biographical narrative may be followed in the collected letters of Nietzsche and his associates:

  • Selected Letters of Friedrich Nietzsche, ed. Christopher Middleton (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1996)
  • Conversations with Nietzsche: A Life in the Words of His Contemporaries, ed. Sander L. Gilman, trans. David J. Parent (New York: Oxford University Press, 1987).

The following list includes a few of the most well known biographies in English.

  • Diethe, Carol. Nietzsche’s Sister and the Will to Power: A Biography of Elisabeth Förster-Nietzsche (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2003).
  • Hayman, Ronald. Nietzsche: A Critical Life (New York: Oxford University Press, 1980).
  • Hollingdale, R. J. Nietzsche, the Man and His Philosophy (Baton Rouge: Louisiana State University Press, 1965).
  • Pletsch, Carl. Young Nietzsche: Becoming a Genius (New York: The Free Press, 1991).
  • Safranski, Rüdiger. Nietzsche: Biographie Seines Denkens (Muenchen: Carl Hanser, 2000).
  • Nietzsche: A Philosophical Biography, trans. Shelley Frisch (New York: Norton, 2002).
  • Salomé, Lou. Nietzsche, ed. and trans. Siegfried Mandel (Redding Ridge, CT: Black Swan, 1988).

e. Commentaries and Scholarly Researches

Hollingdale once wrote that Nietzsche anticipated what would soon become “part of the consciousness of every thinking person” living in the twentieth century and, no doubt, beyond. During the last forty years, Nietzsche scholarship has generated a considerable amount of commentary and research, and some of the most important of these texts were produced by the twentieth century’s most significant thinkers. Even so, the work of elucidating Nietzsche’s thought seems unfinished. The following list is by no means comprehensive, nor does it purport to represent all of the major themes prevalent in Nietzsche scholarship today. It is designed for the reader seeking to learn more about the intellectual history of Nietzsche reception in the twentieth century.

  • Allison, David B. ed.,  The New Nietzsche: Contemporary Styles of Interpretation, (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1985).
  • Allison, David B. Reading the New Nietzsche (Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2001).
  • Ansell-Pearson, Keith. An Introduction to Nietzsche as Political Thinker (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
  • Aschheim, Steven E. The Nietzsche Legacy in Germany: 1890-1990 (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1994).
  • Bambach, Charles R. Heidegger’s Roots: Nietzsche, National Socialism, and the Greeks (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2003).
    • This text delivers a scholarly, critical account of Heidegger’s intellectual encounter with Nietzsche against the politically charged backdrop of Germany in the 1930s.
  • Bataille, Georges. Sur Nietzsche (Paris, Gallimard, 1945), available in English under the title, On Nietzsche, trans. Bruce Boon (New York: Paragon House, 1992).
  • Bataille, Georges. “Nietzsche and the Fascists,” available in Visions of Excess: Selected Writings, 1927-1939 (which includes other essays devoted to Nietzsche), ed. Allan Stoekl, trans. Stoekl, et. al (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1985).
  • Brobjer, Thomas. Nietzsche’s Philosophical Context: An Intellectual Biography (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2008).
    • Brobjer delivers invaluable resource for collating Nietzsche’s writings with the texts that he was himself reading.
  • Clark, Maudemarie. Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
    • This study is representative of the trend in American scholarship emphasizing those parts of Nietzsche’s thought apparently commensurate with pragmatic and neo-Kantian concerns. It is, perhaps, the best point of entry for readers hoping to gain such insight. For Clark, many of Nietzsche’s remarks on truth are simply confused, although he is redeemed as a philosopher by conclusions drawn in 1887 and thereafter.
  • Conway, Daniel W. Nietzsche's Dangerous Game: Philosophy in the Twilight of the Idols (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002).
  • Conway, Daniel W. Nietzsche and the Political (London: Routledge, 1997).
  • Danto, Authur C. Nietzsche as Philosopher (New York: Columbia University Press, 1965).
    • According to Danto, a surprisingly rigorous analytic system of thought is embedded in Nietzsche’s writings, which for Danto are rather poorly executed from a philosophical perspective. In this reading, Nietzsche’s architectonic shortcomings are redeemed, even unconsciously, by the consistency of his polemics.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Nietzsche et la philosophie, (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1962), available in English under the title, Nietzsche and Philosophy, trans. Hugh Thomlinson (New York: Columbia University Press, 1983).
    • Deleuze’s seminal work delivers the classic statement on Nietzsche as a thinker of processes and relations of active and reactive forces. For Deleuze, Nietzsche is a post-Kantian thinker of historical consciousness and a genealogist refuting the dialectic rationalism of Hegel
  • Derrida, Jacques. Spurs: Nietzsche’s Styles (Èperons: Les Styles de Nietzsche), published with French and English facing pages, trans. Barbara Harlow (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1979).
  • Derrida, Jacques . “Interpreting Signatures (Nietzsche/Heidegger): Two Questions,” trans. Diane P. Michelfelder and Richard E. Palmer in Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989).
  • Fink, Eugen. Nietzsches Philosophie (Stuttgart: Kohlhammer, 1960); available in English under the title, Nietzsche’s Philosophy, trans. Goetz Richter (London: Continuum, 2003).
  • Foucault, Michel. “Nietzsche, la généalogie, l’historiè,” in Hommage à Jean Hyppolite (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1971), available in English under the title, “Nietzsche, Genealogy, History,” trans. Donald F. Bouchard and Sherry Simon in The Foucault Reader, ed. Paul Rabinow (New York: Pantheon Books, 1984), 76-100.
    • According to Foucault, Nietzsche’s genealogies eschew the search for origins and teleology with the result of uncovering simply the “play of dominations” in history.
  • Gillespie, Michael Allen. Nihilism Before Nietzsche (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995).
  • Gillespie, Michael Allen and Strong, Tracy B. ed. Nietzsche’s New Seas (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988).
  • Golomb, Jacob and Robert S. Wistrich ed. Nietzsche, Godfather of Fascism? On the Uses and Abuse of a Philosophy (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2002).
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Der philosophische Diskurs der Moderne (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1985), available in English under the title, The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity, trans. Frederick Lawrence (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1987).
    • These lectures offer a historical reading of Nietzsche’s decisive role in interrupting “the discourse of Modernity” and abandoning its emancipatory content. Habermas detects two dominant strains of post-Nietzschean philosophical rhetoric: a Dionysian messianism (transmitted through Heidegger and Derrida) which longs for the absent god and a fetishization of power, heterogeneity, and subversion (found in Bataille and Foucault).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Nietzsches Wort‘Gott is tot,’” in Holzwege (Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann, 1952 [written in 1943]). The essay is available to English readers as “Nietzsche’s Word: God is dead” in The Question Concerning Technology and other essays, trans. William Lovitt; co-edited J. Glenn Gray and Joan Stambaugh (New York: Harper, 1977).
    • This essay is Heidegger’s first published and most concise treatment of Nietzsche.
    • Heidegger’s preparation for this essay includes several lecture courses devoted entirely to Nietzsche’s philosophy, taught at the University of Freiburg from 1936 to 1940.
    • The published form of these lectures first appeared during 1961 in two volumes.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Nietzsche I-II (Pfulligen: Neske, 1961).
    • Beginning in 1979, Heidegger’s Nietzsche lectures at Freiberg became available to English readers in piecemeal fashion, along with other materials in a somewhat confusing manner, in a two edition, four-volume, set.
  • Heidegger, Martin . Nietzsche, vol. I-IV, trans. David Farrell Krell, (San Francisco: Harper, 1979ff).
    • The philosophy of Nietzsche plays a prominent role in several other works by Heidegger.
  • Heidegger, Martin.  “Platons Lehre von der Wahrheit,”(written in 1930, revised in 1940), published in Wegmarken (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 1967); available in English under the title, “Plato’s Doctrine of Truth,” in Pathmarks, ed. William McNeill (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Was Heisst Denken?” (Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1954); available in English under the title, “What is Called Thinking?,” trans. J. Glenn Gray and Fred Wieck (San Francisco: Harper, 1968).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Wer ist Nietzsches Zarathustra?” in Vorträge und Aufsätze (Stuttgart: Neske, 1954); available in English under the title, “Who is Nietzsche’s Zarathustra?” in Nietzsche vol. II trans. David Farrell Krell, (San Francisco: Harper, 1979), 209-233.
  • Jaspers, Karl. Nietzsche. Einführung in das Verständnis seines Philosophierens (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1936); available in English under the title, Nietzsche: An Introduction to the Understanding of His Philosophical Activity, trans. Charles F. Wallraff and Frederick J. Schmitz (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997)
  • Kaufmann, Walter. Nietzsche: Philosopher, Psychologist, Antichrist, 4th edition: (Princeton: PUP, 1974). Kaufmann’s study was a watershed text in the history of Nietzsche reception in the United States
  • Klossowski, Pierre. Nietzsche et le cercle vicieux (Paris: Mercure de France, 1969), available in English under the title, Nietzsche and the Vicious Circle, trans. Daniel W. Smith (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press and Athlone Press, 1997)
  • Lambert, Laurence. Leo Strauss and Nietzsche (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996)
  • Lambert, Laurence. Nietzsche’s Teaching: An Interpretation of ‘Thus Spoke Zarathustra,’ (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986)
  • Leiter, Brian. Nietzsche on Morality (London: Routledge, 2002).
    • Leiter plays down the ineffable aspects of Nietzsche’s thought in order to elaborate formally and concisely Nietzsche’s writings on morality, especially from the Genealogy. This approach lends credit to the claim that Nietzsche was foremost a moral philosopher with pragmatic, even analytic consistency
  • Löwith, Karl. Nietzsche’s Philosophy of the Eternal Return of the Same, trans. J. Harvey Lomax (Berkley: University of California Press, 1997).
    • Löwith’s study was originally produced in the mid 1930’s, during a wave of interest that included treatments by Heidegger and Jaspers. Like these works, Löwith attempted to correct Alfred Bäumler’s political misappropriation. While National Socialist renditions glorify subjectivity and power in will to power and to the exclusion of eternal return and other ineffable concepts, Löwith places eternal return at the forefront of Nietzsche’s thought, arguing that such thought is thereby flawed with internal contradictions
  • MacIntyre, Ben. Forgotten Fatherland: The Search for Elisabeth Nietzsche (New York: Farrar, Strauss, Giroux 1992).
    • This study offers a somewhat informative, if rather sensationalistic, account of Elizabeth and Bernhard Förster’s sordid misadventure in Paraguay. This title should not be counted on, however, for any sort of understanding of Nietzsche’s philosophy
  • Michelfelder, Diane P. and Palmer, Richard E. eds. Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter (Albany: SUNY Press, 1989).
    • This text chronicles an interesting confrontation on Nietzsche reception between two landmark philosophers of the late twentieth century. The encounter regards Heidegger’s reading of Nietzsche and what it implies for post-Heideggerian thought
  • Montinari, Mazzino. Reading Nietzsche trans. Greg Whitlock (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2003).
    • With Giorgio Colli, Montinari was coeditor of the KSA and the first volumes of the KGW. This translation of his collection of lectures and essays originally published in 1982 portrays Nietzsche being primarily interested in science, albeit taken off course for a time by Wagner and their shared interest in Schopenhauer. Montinari’s Nietzsche is best characterized as having a lifelong “passion for knowledge.” However, Montinari’s insights into previous editions of Nietzsche’s corpus, and the editorial politics behind these editions, may be the most valuable parts of this interesting work
  • Mueller-Lauter,Wolfgang. Nietzsche: His Philosophy of Contradictions and the Contradictions of His Philosophy, trans. David J. Parent (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1999)
  • Nehamas, Alexander. Nietzsche: Life as Literature, (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1985).
  • Porter, James I.  Nietzsche and the Philology of the Future (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000).
    • Porter’s study places Nietzsche’s philology in historical context and shows how this training prepared hermeneutic gestures found in later Nietzsche’s philosophy of interpretation
  • Porter, James I. The Invention of Dionysus: An Essay on the Birth of Tragedy (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000)
  • Schacht, Richard. Nietzsche: The Great Philosophers (London: Routledge, 1983)
  • Schacht, Richard. Making Sense of Nietzsche: Reflections Timely and Untimely (Champagne/Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1995)
  • Schrift, Alan D. Nietzsche’s French Legacy: A Genealogy of Poststructuralism (New York: Routledge, 1995).
    • As the title promises, this text surveys aspects of the French reception of Nietzsche
  • Schutte, Ofelia. Beyond Nihilism: Nietzsche Without Masks (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984)
  • Strauss, Leo. “Note on the Plan of Nietzsche’s Beyond Good and Evil” in Studies in Platonic Political Philosophy (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1983).
    • Strauss’ take on Nietzsche, here and elsewhere, has generated quite a bit of scholarship on its own
  • Strong, Tracy B. Friedrich Nietzsche and the Politics of Transfiguration: Expanded Edition, (Berkley: University of California Press, 1988).
    • Strong’s reading is somewhat esoteric, but it nevertheless brings out important political tensions seemingly implied in Nietzsche’s encounter with Socrates, Aeschylus, and other Greeks
  • Vattimo, Gianni. The End of Modernity trans. Jon R. Snyder (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins, 1988)
  • Vattimo, Gianni. Nihilism and Emancipation (New York: Columbia University Press, 2004).
    • With these titles and several others, Vattimo takes up Heidegger’s transmission of Nietzsche and works out the issue of “completed nihilism” with impressive results. Vattimo’s Nietzsche emerges as one of the best philosophical resources for grounding emancipatory discourse in the twentieth first century
  • Waite, Geoff. Nietzsche’s Corps/e, (Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 1996).
    • Waite offers a richly thematized, innovative Kulturkampf using Nietzsche-reception itself as a wedge for breaking open a variety of late-twentieth century issues
  • Yovel, Yirmiyahu. Dark Riddle: Hegel, Nietzsche, and the Jews (University Park, PA: Penn State University Press, 1998)
  • Zimmerman, Michael. Heidegger’s Confrontation with Modernity: Technology, Politics, Art (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990).
    • Zimmerman delivers a useful text for understanding this key conduit of Nietzsche reception.

f. Academic Journals in Nietzsche Studies

In addition to a typically large number full-length manuscripts on Nietzsche published every year, scholarly works in English may be found in general, academic periodicals focused on Continental philosophy, ethical theory, critical theory, the history of ideas and similar themes. In addition, some major journals are devoted entirely to Nietzsche and aligned topics. Related both to the issue of orthodoxy and to the backlash against multiplicity in Nietzsche interpretation, the value of having so many outlets available for Nietzsche commentators has even been questioned. The following journals are devoted specifically to Nietzsche studies.

  • Nietzsche-Studien (Berlin: de Gruyter).
  • The Journal of Nietzsche Studies (University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press).
  • New Nietzsche Studies: The Journal of the Nietzsche Society (New York: Nietzsche Society).

Author Information

Dale Wilkerson
University of North Texas, Denton
U. S. A.

Śāntideva (fl. 8th c.)

Śāntideva (literally “god of peace”) was the name given to an Indian Mahāyāna Buddhist philosopher-monk, known as the author of two texts, the Bodhicaryāvatāra and the Śikṣāsamuccaya. These works both express the ideal of the bodhisattva — the ideal person of Mahāyāna Buddhism. The term Mahāyāna, literally “Great Vehicle,” came into use to mean the idea of attempting to become a bodhisattva (and eventually a buddha) oneself, rather than merely following the teachings set out by Siddhārtha Gautama (considered the original Buddha). This was the earliest usage of the term mahāyāna in Sanskrit, although even by Śāntideva's time, understandings of what becoming a bodhisattva involved had undergone many changes; the Mahāyāna had come to be understood as a separate school rather than as a vocation (see Nattier 2003; Harrison 1987).

Both of Śāntideva's texts explore the bodhisattva ideal as an ethical one, in that they prescribe how a person should properly live, and provide reasons for living in that way. Śāntideva's close attention to ethics makes him relatively unusual among Indian philosophers, for whom metaphysics (or theoretical philosophy more generally) was more typically the primary concern. Śāntideva’s ethical thought is widely known, cited  and loved among Tibetan Buddhists, and is increasingly coming to the attention of Western thinkers. Śāntideva's metaphysics is of interest primarily because of its close connection to his ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Works
    1. Writings
    2. Life
    3. Reception and Influence
  2. The Progress of the Bodhisattva
  3. Excellence in Means
  4. Good and Bad Karma
  5. The Perfections
    1. Giving
      1. Giving as Giving Up
      2. Upward Gifts: Expressing Esteem
      3. Downward Gifts: Attracting Others
    2. Good Conduct
    3. Patient Endurance
      1. Happiness from Enduring Suffering
      2. The Case Against Anger
    4. Heroic Strength
    5. Meditation
      1. Equalization of Self and Other
      2. Exchange of Self and Other
      3. Meditations Against the Three Poisons
    6. Metaphysical Insight
      1. Content
      2. Practical Implications
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Translations Cited
    3. General Studies of Śāntideva
    4. Specialized Studies
    5. Related Interest

1. History and Works

a. Writings

The name “Śāntideva” is associated above all with two extant texts: the Bodhicaryāvatāra (hereafter BCA) and the Śikṣāsamuccaya (hereafter ŚS). The Bodhicaryāvatāra (often rendered “Guide to the Bodhisattva’s Way of Life”), in its most widely known form, is a work of just over 900 verses. Tibetan legends suggest that the text was originally recited orally (see de Jong 1975), as do the text’s own literary features. Although it has been translated into Tibetan multiple times and is revered throughout Tibetan Buddhist tradition, it was originally composed and redacted in Sanskrit. Its Sanskrit is relatively close to Pānini’s official standards of grammar, with a Buddhist vocabulary.  Its ten chapters lead their reader through the path to becoming a bodhisattva — which is to say a future Buddha, and therefore a being on the way to perfection, according to Mahāyāna tradition.

The Śikṣāsamuccaya (“Training Anthology”) is a longer prose work in nineteen chapters. The ŚS is organized as a commentary on twenty-seven short mnemonic verses known as the Śikṣāsamuccaya Kārikā (hereafter ŚSK). It consists primarily of quotations (of varying length) from sūtras, authoritative texts considered to be the word of the Buddha — generally those sūtras associated with Mahāyāna tradition. Most scholars have taken the ŚS to be composed almost entirely of such quotations. However, Paul Harrison (2007) has recently claimed that a substantial portion of it is original to the redactor.

Like the BCA, the ŚS was originally composed in Sanskrit, as were the sūtras it quotes. However, while Śāntideva's own portions are in relatively standard Sanskrit, the quotations are mostly in the heavily vernacularized language usually known as Buddhist Hybrid Sanskrit. It is considerably less accessible to a novice reader than the BCA, and its organization can be bewildering. Richard Mahoney (2002) has recently provided a clear account of the text’s structure, which will be discussed later in this article.

Who were these texts written for? One can infer from the texts that they are intended for an audience of men whose sexual desires are directed toward women, as the auditor’s sexual cravings are always discussed in those terms. Therefore, the use of masculine forms to refer to the implied audience is unproblematic. This auditor also understands Sanskrit, and lives in or after the seventh century CE. His knowledge of Sanskrit implies, at the least, that he is well educated, and therefore well versed in the ideas of classical Sanskritic culture. And he is not necessarily on the bodhisattva path when he begins reading or hearing the texts, but is motivated to enter that path by studying them.

The texts’ implied audience includes monks, and may also include householders (nonmonks). While monks are a significant component of the text’s implied audience (Onishi 2003), and are in some respects the ideal audience, they are not necessarily the only such audience. The principles of conduct put forth in the BCA’s fifth chapter resemble those of vinaya monastic codes, and indeed some of them have been taken directly from the prātimokṣa monastic rule books (Crosby and Skilton 1995, 32), but few of them would be impossible or absurd for a householder to follow. In the ŚS, too, Śāntideva certainly considers monasticism better and more praiseworthy than the householder life, but part of his task is to convince householding readers to pursue the monastic life. He claims that “in every birth the great bodhisattva goes forth [as a monk] . . . from the household life” (ŚS 14). But this is a process renewed in every lifetime, beginning with the household life; and Śāntideva does refer on multiple occasions to householding bodhisattvas (for example at ŚS 120 and 267). This text, then, is addressed in part to householders.

b. Life

Tibetan hagiographic histories (Bu ston, Tāranātha, Ye shes dPal ‘byor and Sum pa mKhan po) provide the most detailed accounts of Śāntideva's life, although most contemporary historians doubt their veracity. In brief, they tell of a prince from Saurāstra (in contemporary Gujarat) who joined the great monastic university of Nālandā. His fellow monks, unaware of his wisdom, saw only a lazy man unworthy of their company. To prove his presumed lack of knowledge, they asked him to recite a Buddhist sūtra text. Śāntideva, undaunted, asked whether they would like to hear something old or something new. Asked for something new, he proceeded to recite the BCA. When he reached verse IX.34 — “When neither an entity nor a nonentity remain before thought, then thought, with no object, is pacified because it has no other destination” — he rose into the air and his body disappeared. The remainder of the text was recited by a disembodied voice. The written text of the ŚS, the voice told the audience, could be found in Śāntideva's room, along with a text called the Sūtrasamuccaya (Pezzali 1968, 4-20). There is some debate among scholars as to the nature of the latter work, but all agree that the title does not refer to any additional surviving work of Śāntideva's, and that the BCA and ŚS constitute his extant corpus (see Lele 2007, 17n8).

Beyond the hagiographies, most of what we know of Śāntideva comes from the ideas found in extant recensions of his texts. This article treats Śāntideva's works together, as the works of a single author, as Indian and Tibetan Buddhist tradition has always done; similarly, it refers to the ideas found in the canonical Sanskrit recensions of the texts, not to the Tibetan or to the BCA recension found at Dunhuang. Since the article’s approach is to examine the ideas of this author, Śāntideva, it spends relatively little time on the structure of each of his two texts as separate units. For an overview of the relevant textual issues and a defense of this article’s approach to the texts, see Lele 2007, 9-31. More specifically, for a discussion of the Dunhuang recension, see Saito 1993. For discussions of the structure of the BCA, see Crosby and Skilton 1995; Saito 1993. For discussions of the structure of the ŚS, see Clayton 2006; Griffiths 1999, 133-43; Hedinger 1984; Mahoney 2002; Mrozik 2007. On both, see Pezzali 1968.

It is difficult to learn much about the texts’ historical composer, or their redactor, beyond what is found in the texts themselves. As noted, Tibetan historians recount the life story of a Śāntideva identified as the texts’ author, but it is difficult to sort fact from legend with so little corroborating evidence. There seems little reason to doubt that someone by the name of Śāntideva wrote some portion of the two texts, or that he was a monk at Nālandā. (The Tibetan historians agree on this last point, and based on what we know of Indian Buddhist history it seems a likely place for historically significant Buddhist works to have been composed.) Paul Griffiths (1999, 114-24) uses the accounts of Chinese and Tibetan visitors to reconstruct a detailed account of what life and literary culture at Nālandā might have looked like.

Beyond these points, we can say relatively little beyond the approximate date of the texts’ composition. The Tibetan translator Ye shes sde, who rendered the BCA into Tibetan, worked under the king Khri lde srong brtsan (816-838 CE), so it must have been composed before that time (Bendall 1970, v). Since the Chinese pilgrim Yijing (or I-tsing) mentions all the major Indian Mahāyāna thinkers known in India but does not mention Śāntideva, it is likely that these texts were composed, or at least became famous, after Yijing left India in 685 CE (Pezzali 1968, 38). We may therefore assign Śāntideva an approximate date of  sometime in the eighth century.

c. Reception and Influence

As historical evidence on India is difficult to come by, it is relatively difficult to ascertain Śāntideva's influence in the later Indian Buddhist philosophical tradition. Nevertheless, a significant number of later Indian texts do refer to the BCA and ŚS (Bendall 1970, viii-x), so Śāntideva's work must have been relatively important there.

It is far easier to speak of Śāntideva's influence in Tibet. Tibetan Buddhists revere Śāntideva and his work, especially the BCA. All the major Tibetan texts on the stages of the bodhisattva path, such as those of Tsong kha pa and sGam po pa, quote it at length (Sweet 1977, 4-5); it is a key  source for the entire Tibetan literary genre of blo sbyong or lojong (“mental purification”) (Sweet 1996, 245). The present Dalai Lama cites it as the highest inspiration for his ideals and practices (Williams 1995, ix). Tibetan commentators have written many commentaries on the text over the years, several of which are now available in English translation (e.g. Gyatso 1986; Rinpoche 2002; Tobden 2005). While the ŚS was less influential overall, the tradition has not ignored it. In 1998 the present Dalai Lama gave public teachings on the ŚS, referring to it as a “key which can unlock all the teachings of the Buddha” (quoted in Clayton 2006, 2). Śāntideva's work has played a significant role in other cultures influenced by Tibetan Buddhism, such as Mongolia (see, for example, de Rachewiltz 1996; Kanaoka 1963). A less influential translation of the BCA was also made into Chinese (Bendall 1970, xxix-xxx).

The BCA has also been widely translated, studied, and admired in the West. (See Onishi 2003 for a thesis-length discussion of the text's Western reception.) Luís Gómez (1999, 262-3) even suggests that it is now the third most frequently translated text in all of Indian Buddhism, after the Dhammapāda and the Heart Sūtra. A recent introductory text (Cooper 1998) also treats the BCA as one of “the classic readings” in ethics, alongside such works as Plato’s Gorgias and Mill’s Utilitarianism.  The BCA is an appropriate choice for a reading in Buddhist ethics, for relatively few Buddhist texts make explicit ethical arguments. This situation even leads one scholar (Keown 2005, 50) to proclaim that Buddhism “does not have normative ethics,” though he does not appear to have taken Śāntideva's work into account in making this claim (see Lele 2007, 48-52).

2. The Progress of the Bodhisattva

The central concern of both of Śāntideva's texts is the bodhisattva, literally “awakening-being.” A bodhisattva is a being aiming to become a buddha (literally “awakened one”); the process of the final transformation into a buddha is called bodhi, “awakening,” sometimes referred to as “enlightenment.” The title Bodhicaryâvatāra, “introduction to conduct for awakening,” is usually taken to be short for Bodhisattvacaryâvatāra — “introduction to the conduct of a bodhisattva,” or “A Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life,” as one major translation (Wallace and Wallace 1997) has it. “Introduction to the conduct of a bodhisattva” is an appropriate description of the contents of the text, although “introduction to conduct for awakening” would be equally appropriate. Śāntideva also introduces the Śikṣāsamuccaya by claiming he will explain the sugatâtmajasamvārâvatāra, a similar phrase meaning “introduction to the requirements for the sons of the Sugatas” (ŚS 1). (Throughout Buddhist literature sugata, literally “gone well,” is a common term for buddhas, and Mahāyāna literature regularly refers to bodhisattvas as the buddhas’ sons.) The term “bodhisattva” occurs at least seven times in the nineteen chapters of the ŚS. This section examines the bodhisattva’s progress from being an ordinary person through to being a buddha, as this progress is discussed in Śāntideva's texts.

To describe those who are neither bodhisattvas nor buddhas, Śāntideva most frequently uses the term “ordinary person,” prithagjana. He refers at one point to “all buddhas, bodhisattvas, solitary buddhas, noble searchers and ordinary people” (ŚS 9) — suggesting that ordinary people are the residual category of all those who do not fall into the previous categories. It is standard in Mahāyāna texts to refer to three “vehicles” (yāna) or paths, with the vehicles of the searcher (śrāvaka) and solitary buddha (pratyekabuddha) being distinguished from the Great Vehicle (mahāyāna) of the bodhisattva. It is quite rare, however, for Śāntideva to refer to searchers and solitary buddhas, and even buddhas appear relatively infrequently, so in practice the most important distinction in his texts is between bodhisattvas and ordinary people.

Śāntideva's view of ordinary people is not flattering. The term “ordinary person” frequently occurs in his work alongside the term “fool” (bāla) — sometimes with the latter as a modifier (“foolish ordinary person,” bālaprithagjana, as at ŚS 61) and sometimes with the two terms used synonymously and interchangeably, as at ŚS 194. Ordinary people’s foolishness traps them in suffering; the way for them to escape from suffering is to enter the bodhisattva path and become a bodhisattva.

To become a bodhisattva, one must possess the awakening mind (bodhicitta). This mental transformation brings one out of the status of ordinary person and points one toward awakening. Śāntideva makes an important distinction between two kinds of the awakening mind: the mind resolved on awakening (bodhipraṇidhicitta) and the mind proceeding to awakening (bodhiprasthānacitta). The first, he tells us, can be reached quickly; it exists when the thought “I must become a buddha” arises as a vow (ŚS 8). He is not as explicit about the nature of the second, but in describing the first he notes that “the awakening mind is productive even without conduct” (ŚS 9), suggesting that conduct (caryā, bodhicaryā) may be what makes the difference between the mind resolved on awakening and the mind proceeding to awakening. (Brassard 2000 is a book-length study of the awakening mind and the BCA.)

It would appear, however, that possession of the mind resolved on awakening     is sufficient to make its possessor into a bodhisattva. The BCA, recall, suggests that it is intended to be ritually recited. Its reader develops the awakening mind while reciting the third chapter sincerely — saying “Therefore I will produce the awakening mind for the welfare of the world” (BCA III.23). Two verses later, the reciter, apparently not having done anything else in the intervening time, declares: “Today I have been born into the family of the buddhas; now I am a child of the buddhas,” which is to say a bodhisattva(BCA III.25).

This is not, of course, the end of the story. Such a beginning bodhisattva has just started on the path; he has a long task ahead of him. Śāntideva does not spell out the different levels of attainment that a bodhisattva may reach, but he suggests that he agrees with the account of ten stages (bhūmi) of a bodhisattva’s achievement, as set out in the Daśabhūmika Sūtra and followed in Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakâvatāra (see Sprung 1979 for a partial translation of, and commentary on, this latter text). The ŚS quotes the Daśabhūmika six times. In this context, Śāntideva distinguishes between “one who has entered a stage” (bhūmipraviṣṭa) and a beginning (ādikarmika) bodhisattva (ŚS 11), suggesting that beginning bodhisattvas have not even entered the first of the ten stages.

Notice, however, that the BCA’s reciter does not become a bodhisattva, even a beginning one, until taking the vow in the third chapter. So Śāntideva's audience, it would seem, is not limited to bodhisattvas — a point strengthened by the profuse praises of the awakening mind in the opening chapters of both texts. The reader who starts the text might not have generated the awakening mind, hence not have started trying to become a bodhisattva, and needs to be convinced of the importance of doing so.

The eighteenth chapter of the ŚS gives some account of the end of the path. It gives a fantastical description of the buddhas — their great beauty, virtue and power (ŚS 318-22). Shortly afterwards, it also describes the qualities of bodhisattvas in similar terms  and at greater length. It is difficult to imagine how a reader who had just become a bodhisattva, taking the vow, could see himself as described by these qualities — spontaneously emitting perfumes and garlands and pearls from his body, for example (ŚS 327) — so this is likely the culmination of a long period of effort, in the last stages of which one becomes a fully realized bodhisattva. The distinctions between buddhas and fully realized bodhisattvas are not clearly spelled out; one suspects that being one of these advanced bodhisattvas is almost as good as being an actual buddha.

3. Excellence in Means

To interpret Śāntideva's ethics in the BCA and ŚS, it is important to turn to the concept of excellence in means (upāyakauśalya). This common Mahāyāna concept is best known as a way of explaining the existence of other Buddhist traditions, as in texts like the Lotus Sūtra: the Buddha preached mainstream Buddhism as a clever way to reach people who were not ready to receive the superior teaching of the Mahāyāna. (See Pye 1978 for a book-length discussion.)

The term has a number of different senses in Buddhist tradition (see Harvey 2000, 134-40). Some Mahāyāna texts treat excellence in means as the seventh of ten perfections or virtues (pāramitā); Śāntideva does not do this, as he adheres to the conception that there are only six perfections (on which see below). For him, there are two senses in which the idea is important. The first is hermeneutical: different teachings are intended for people at different levels of ability, with the idea of ultimate truth at the very highest level (see BCA IX.2-8). For this reason the BCA is usually understood as a progressive text, leading its audience through progressively deeper levels of practice and understanding (e.g. see Crosby and Skilton 1995, 83-6). Śāntideva does not specifically use the term “excellence in means” to refer to this idea, although it is a common name for the idea in other Mahāyāna texts (Harvey 2000, 134). The second sense of the term is ethical; the idea most frequently comes up when he quotes the Upāyakauśalya Sūtra, a text which claims that bodhisattvas may break standard precepts or rules out of compassion. (The sūtra exists in Chinese and has been translated into English twice: Chang 1991, 427-68, and Tatz 1994.)

This second sense of excellence in means takes on considerable importance in contemporary discussions of Śāntideva's ethics (e.g. Clayton 2006, 102-9) because it is under this rubric that Śāntideva comes closest to addressing the “hard cases” so beloved of contemporary moral philosophy, such as situations when one seems called on to kill in order to prevent a greater evil. While discussing excellence in means, he explains that behaviors normally forbidden, including sexual activity, can be permitted out of compassion. So too, it is to explain the importance of excellence in means that Śāntideva notes that one is permitted to kill someone about to commit a grave wrong. The idea is important to this article for similar reasons, in that it seems to be a key principle involved in what we might call Śāntideva's casuistry — his examination of particular cases where different pieces of advice seem to collide.

For Śāntideva, a key component of excellence in means is that it is an excellence — a skill and a virtue which allows one to respond appropriately to difficult situations, if not a virtue on the official list of six perfections. There is no one formula or principle for action that Śāntideva sets out in advance (along the lines of “act to bring about the greatest happiness for the greatest number” or “act only according to that maxim you can also will to be a universal law”). As we will shortly see, there are definite elements of consequentialist reasoning in Śāntideva, but more often the bodhisattva is called on to exercise judgment, once his character is already well developed: When Śāntideva says that “even the forbidden is permitted,” it is specifically “for a compassionate one who has sight of the purpose” (BCA V.84); that is, it depends on the agent’s ability to exercise discretion in the name of compassion.

This level of discretion is evinced in the numerous places in Śāntideva's work where difficult cases are considered. When he approves of the killing of someone about to commit a grave wrong, he says only that there is “permission” (anujñāna), not that it must be done. Similarly, in the case of alcoholics, alcohol may be given; Śāntideva uses the gerundive form deya (ŚS 271), and the gerundive in -ya does not have the imperative force of the gerundive in -tavya.

Śāntideva explicitly refers to consequences in the case of giving a weapon: one may do so after the “consideration of good or bad consequences” (ŚS 271). This is still a consideration or reflection rather than a maximizing or weighing; “consideration,” vicāra, is literally “moving around (in the mind).” A weighing of some sort comes across in introducing the possibility that one might have sex out of compassion: “even then, if one should see a greater benefit (artha) to beings, one may discard the training” (ŚS 167). Some sort of consequentialist maximizing appears to be at work here. Clayton (2006, 107) suggests that such concern for consequences means that these “examples of upāya become problematic from the perspective of a virtue ethic.” However, for Śāntideva, any true “benefit” to other beings will ultimately be an increase in their virtue. Goodman (2008) argues strongly for a consequentialist interpretation of Śāntideva's ethics, but on the understanding that it is a “perfectionist consequentialism,” in which the consequences to be maximized consist of virtue in oneself and others.

4. Good and Bad Karma

The terms “good karma” and “bad karma,” respectively, translate the Sanskrit terms puṇya and pāpa. These terms appear very frequently in Śāntideva's work — often as justifications for acting and feeling in a certain way. They refer to a kind of ethical causality: the process by which ethically good and bad actions (respectively) have positive and negative results. These results most characteristically, but not exclusively, include better and worse rebirths. The Sanskrit terms parallel the English usage of “good and bad karma,” thought of as the way in which one’s good or bad actions come back to affect one positively or negatively in the future. This usage corresponds exactly to the meaning of the Buddhist terms puṇya and pāpa, even though those terms do not themselves involve the Sanskrit word karma or karman (which simply means “action”). There is, at any rate, no disputing the close connection between Sanskrit karma, on the one hand, and puṇya and pāpa on the other; the latter are typically referred to in Sanskrit as karmaphala, the fruits of action.

The concepts of good and bad karma are central to Śāntideva's thought. The ŚS is typically thought to be structured around the idea, presented inŚSK 4, that one should “protect, purify and enhance” one’s person, one’s possessions and one's good karma, though one should also be prepared to give all of these things away (Bendall 1970, xi). ŚS 356 connects each of these verbs to good and bad karma: to “protect” something is to prevent new karmically bad mental states (dharmas) related to it; to “purify” it is to reduce the existing karmically bad states related to it; and to “enhance” it is to increase the karmically good states related to it. (Mahoney 2002, 32-9 identifies the significance of these verbs with respect to the traditional Buddhist samyakprahānas or “right strivings”.) In a certain sense, one might see the ŚS as being all about good and bad karma — a sense strengthened by the long discussions of bad karma in ŚS III, IV and VIII, and of the good karma deriving from worship in ŚS XVII. In the BCA, too, the final chapter — the highest and most important, if one adheres strictly to a progressive understanding of the text — deals with the redirection (pariṇāmanā) of good karma. Dayal (1970, 189-90) goes so far as to say that Śāntideva substituted karmic redirection for metaphysical insight as the ultimate goal of the bodhisattva path. Clayton (2006, 83) and Lele (2007, 96-7) argue that Dayal’s claim is overstated, but neither dispute that good and bad karma are vitally important to Śāntideva's work. Clayton (2006, 67) identifies three terms closely related to good karma (kuśala, śīla and puṇya) as the most central ethical concepts in the ŚS, and even as “probably the most important ethical concepts in Indian Buddhism” more generally.

The redirection of good karma (often called “transference of merit”) is a central part of Śāntideva's understanding of karma’s workings. He urges his readers to redirect any good karma that they acquire, so that it does not merely result in a worldly form of well-being, such as a more prosperous rebirth for oneself. This redirection can sometimes be to ensure that the good karma brings one closer to awakening instead of worldly rebirths (bodhipariṇāmanā, ŚS 158); see Kajiyama 1989 for a discussion of this first form, which is often neglected in studies of karmic redirection. More frequently, though, it means the giving up of one’s good karma to others (puṇyotsarga). This is a common idea in Buddhist texts. Buddhist stories often emphasize the supernatural nature of karmic redirection. Especially, they commonly claim or imply that ghosts (pretas or petas) are incapable of receiving physical gifts. If one wishes to give them something, it must be one’s good karma(Kajiyama 1989, 7-8).

In contemporary philosophical terms, Śāntideva's idea of karma suggests, though not conclusively, an internal connection between virtue or ethical excellence and well-being. That is, he often uses these terms in a way that suggests that virtue is well-being in many significant senses. He does this by using puṇya in ways that make it equivalent both to virtue or excellence and to well-being or flourishing. Śāntideva uses the term for good karma (puṇya) interchangeably with the terms for good conduct (śīla) and excellence (kuśala) (see Lele 2007, 79-82)(Clayton 2006, 73). Even more frequently, however, he equates it with well-being or welfare, śubha, as Clayton (2006, 48-51) notes. This equivalence suggests a sense in which, on Śāntideva's understanding, good karma not only produces well-being, but is well-being — constitutive of a good life, at least at the level of conventional truth. There does remain some ambiguity, however, in the sense that Śāntideva's work also suggests that well-being is the product of the result or “ripening” (vipāka) of good karma.

This ambiguity may be compared to that in Greek conceptions of eudaimonia, which also means human welfare or flourishing, but includes a strong element of excellence (aretē) as well. To the extent that good karma is equated with excellence, Śāntideva's thought resembles that of the Stoics, who thought that excellence alone constituted well-being. To the extent that good karma is equated with the results of excellent action, however, it looks more like Aristotle’s view, where “external goods,” outside the control of the agent’s excellence or lack thereof, are intrinsic components of well-being. (See Greek Philosophy and Stoicism.) However, Śāntideva does not ever suggest, as Aristotle does, that everyone aims at well-being but not everyone knows what it is (NE 1095a).

However we interpret the relation between action and result, it would seem that for Śāntideva good karma, as a complex of virtue and well-being, effectively constitutes its own intrinsic reason for action, as eudaimonia does. That a given action or mental state is karmically good, and that it is good per se, seem to be one and the same; Śāntideva does not make claims of the form “one should refrain from an action or mental state in spite of the good karma it generates,” or “one should have an action or mental state even though it is karmically bad.” Amod Lele argues that “there are a number of cases where it would seem like Śāntideva is saying it is not good to have more good karma, but in nearly all such cases, he actually ends up saying that the apparent loss of good karma turns out to bring more good karma” (Lele 2007, 85-7, emphasis in original).

5. The Perfections

Śāntideva typically describes the bodhisattva in terms of his six “perfections” (pāramitās); e.g., ŚS 97, 187. The perfections are beneficial and valuable traits of character, similar to Aristotelian virtues or excellences. This article renders Śāntideva's term pāramitā as the literal “perfection” rather than as “virtue” because Śāntideva does discuss other virtues — beneficial traits of character — which are not themselves considered pāramitās, such as nonattachment and esteem.

The six perfections are nearly always arranged in ascending order: giving or generosity (dāna), good conduct (śīla), patient endurance (kṣānti), heroic strength (vīrya), meditation (dhyāna) and metaphysical insight (prajñā). An observer might be tempted to apply Aristotle’s classification  of the virtues  here and identify the first four as “moral” virtues, the sixth (and possibly the fifth) as “intellectual.” However, one should bear in mind the significance of Aristotle’s distinction: intellectual virtues are primarily attained through teaching, moral virtues through habituation (NE 1103a). Śāntideva does not distinguish the perfections in this regard; as we will see in the section on metaphysical insight below, in many ways it too is acquired through habituation.

The perfections are sufficiently important to Śāntideva's ethical thought that  both of his texts are to some extent structured around them. The final four perfections are explicitly identified, in turn, as the topics of the BCA’s chapters VI through IX. Patient endurance and heroic strength are also identified as the topics of ŚS chapters IX and X. While the first two perfections — giving or generosity (dāna) and good conduct (śīla) — do not receive their own chapter headings, they do have an important place in Śāntideva's ethical worldview, as we will see.

a. Giving

Śāntideva uses the term dāna to refer both to the act of giving, and to the perfection which might more idiomatically be rendered into English as generosity (dānapāramitā). He does not usually distinguish between the two. This article follows his usage and uses “giving” and “generosity” as synonyms.

Giving has relatively little role in the BCA except for its role in the redirection of good karma, mentioned above. In the ŚS, however, it takes pride of place. The first chapter of the ŚS closes by claiming that “giving alone is the bodhisattva’s awakening” (ŚS 34).  Richard Mahoney (2002), undertaking a detailed study of the ŚS’s structure, has demonstrated that the entire text is effectively organized around the idea of protecting, purifying and enhancing one’s person, possessions and good karma — culminating in giving each of these three things away.

Why is giving so important to Śāntideva? For him, giving serves at least three important and distinct purposes: first, the development of nonattachment; second, the “upward” expression of esteem (śraddhā); and third, “downward” compassionate benefit to others. Each of these three, for him, is an essential component of the bodhisattva path, and giving allows one to realize each component, though in different ways.

i. Giving as Giving Up

The first reason Śāntideva offers for giving is that one should not be attached to things in the first place; one should be ready to give them away. Śāntideva sometimes uses terms, utsarga and tyāga, which have both the sense of “giving” and of “renunciation.” By giving something to another person, one both demonstrates one’s own lack of attachment to it and minimizes the risk that it will cause future attachment. As a result, one generates a great deal of good karma. Here giving is primarily “giving up”; “giving to” is a secondary function. Śāntideva expresses this rationale for giving most forcefully in a long passage excerpted here:

What is given must no longer be guarded; what is at home must be guarded. What is given is [the cause] for the reduction of craving (triṣṇā); what is at home is the increase of craving. What is given is nonattachment (aparigraha); what is at home is with attachment (saparigraha). What is given is safe; what is at home is dangerous. What is given is [the cause] for supporting the path of awakening; what is at home is [the cause] for supporting Māra [the demonic tempter]. What is given is imperishable; what is at home is perishable. From what is given [comes] happiness; having obtained what is at home, [there is] suffering. (ŚS 19)

This passage indicates a common theme in Śāntideva's work, one more radical than some other Buddhist takes on attachment and possession. It is not merely that a bodhisattva should avoid attachment to possessions, but that the possessions are themselves potentially harmful, because having them creates a danger of increasing one’s attachment to them. Thus Śāntideva claims elsewhere that a bodhisattva “should have fear of material gain (lābha) and of honour,” (ŚSK 16) and that “great gain is among the obstacles to the Mahāyāna” (ŚS 145).

ii. Upward Gifts: Expressing Esteem

The second reason for giving is to express one’s esteem or trust (śraddhā) in beings who have achieved a higher level on the bodhisattva path. The term śraddhā has a number of different and related senses, usually blending together: esteem, trust, confidence, devotion, faith. Maria Hibbets’s (2000) rendering “esteem” may come closest overall to the sense in which Śāntideva uses the term, though it loses the important connotation of trust. Śraddhā, Śāntideva says, is the prasāda (peaceful pleasure) of an unsoiled mind, rooted in respect (gaurava, literally “weightiness,” like the Latin gravitas), without arrogance (ŚS 5). Those without esteem oppose or ridicule buddhas (ŚS 174). One with esteem will listen whenever the Buddha’s word is spoken (ŚS 15); esteem is that by which one approaches the noble ones (Buddhas) and does not do what should not be done (ŚS 316).

When a householder makes a gift to a monk, especially a gift of food, it is called a śraddhādeya, a gift by esteem (ŚS 137-8). Similarly, when the aspiring bodhisattva makes offerings to advanced bodhisattvas and buddhas as part of the seven-part Anuttarapūjā ritual worship in BCA II.10-19, the act expresses esteem. Śāntideva does not use the word śraddhā in this passage, but the feelings it evokes match his descriptions of esteem elsewhere: a pleasurable trust in more advanced beings, recognizing their status as more advanced, that leads to better actions. Just before describing the fabulous offerings he gives, Śāntideva's narrator describes the esteem he places in the buddhas and bodhisattvas and the good action that will result from doing so:

by becoming your possession, I am in a state of fearlessness; I make the well-being of all beings. I overcome previous bad karma and will make no further bad karma. (BCA II.9)

This esteem has deeply important benefits. It is a pleasure taken in good actions; it is “a maker of gladness about renunciation, a maker of excitement about the Jinas’ (Buddhas’) dharma” (ŚS 3). This combination of trust and pleasure leads one on to good action; as Śāntideva says, those who always have esteem toward a respectable Buddha will abandon neither good conduct nor training (ŚS 3). So the practice of esteem helps increase one’s good karma (ŚS 317).  Moreover, to encourage the growth of esteem in a giver, when an aspiring bodhisattva receives a gift, he encourages the giver and makes him feel excited about giving it (ŚS 150).

iii. Downward Gifts: Attracting Others

When one gives for either of the above reasons (expressing nonattachment or expressing esteem), one effectively does so for one’s own spiritual benefit. But Śāntideva also says that one gives to all beings (sarvasatvebhyas, ŚSK 4), for their enjoyment (ŚSK 5), adding that one also preserves the gift for the sake of their enjoyment (satvôpabhogārtham, ŚSK 6). Here he is advocating a different kind of giving, motivated by compassion and aimed at benefitting the recipient. The distinction between the second two types of giving corresponds to Maria Heim’s (Heim 2004, 74-5) distinction between “upward” and “downward” giving, out of esteem and out of compassion.

The reasons Śāntideva offers for downward giving are not as straightforward as they may first appear. For Śāntideva, the recipient of a gift benefits less from possessing the gift object, and more from receiving it in a gift encounter. When a bodhisattva gives a gift, he attracts the recipient to the bodhisattva path, so that the recipient is more likely to become a virtuous bodhisattva. The gift object itself provides little benefit, and could even be harmful (2007, 136-75).

As well as giving possessions and more conventional goods, one also gives good karma to others through its redirection (parināmanā), as noted above. Since Śāntideva tends to see good karma as intrinsically good, in this case the recipient is more likely to benefit from the gift itself. Even so, good karma involves a potential danger, since if it is not redirected it can lead merely to dangerous wealth rather than to awakening.

b. Good Conduct

Of all the perfections, Śāntideva tells us the least about the second one, śīla. This Sanskrit and Pali term has a general sense of “good conduct” or “good habits,” but its particular meaning is less clear. Unlike the final four perfections, it is not identified specifically as the single topic of a chapter in the BCA, and the chapters identified with it in the ŚS (II and V) make little reference to it. Unlike giving, it is not discussed at systematic length in either text. Śāntideva sometimes uses the term in a broad sense that would seem to encompass all of the perfections, to the point of using it interchangeably with puṇya, good karma, or śubha, well-being (Clayton 2006, 73). ŚS chapter V, entitled Śīlapāramitāyām Anarthavarjanam — abandoning of the worthless with respect to the perfection of good conduct — seems like a miscellany of topics, describing a wide variety of actions that Śāntideva endorses. A reader may then be tempted to take up the common usage in which this good conduct refers to “morality,” “virtue” or “ethics” in a general sense (see Clayton 2006, 72-3) — perhaps even a sense that includes the other perfections.

Yet Śāntideva does give some further specification of a way in which he understands “good conduct,” conceptually distinct from the other perfections, even though he does not stick consistently to this usage. His one reference to the perfection of good conduct in the BCA proclaims: “when the mind of cessation (viraticitta) is obtained, the perfection of good conduct is understood [to exist]” (BCAP 53). The ŚS specifies the goal of good conduct in a similar vein, but is more specific about what constitutes good conduct: “whichever practices are causes of meditative concentration (samādhi), those are included in good conduct” (ŚS 121). It seems that good conduct, when understood as a single perfection, consists primarily of practices that aid one to concentrate one’s mind and still its uncontrolled activity.

This suggestion is borne out by the content of the fifth BCA chapter, which, following up the claim about the mind of cessation, details exactly these sorts of practices. (Since this chapter comes immediately before the chapter on patient endurance — the third perfection — it would be a logical place for Śāntideva to discuss good conduct, the second perfection.) The chapter begins by warning the reader of the dangers of an unrestrained mind, comparing it to a mad, rutting elephant, and then specifies a number of practices that Śāntideva claims will help the mind remain under control.  We may imagine, then, that this chapter gives us some idea of what Śāntideva means by the perfection of good conduct.

The practices bear some resemblance to Buddhist monastic rules (vinaya), although they could all be followed by lay householders and the text does not restrict them to monks. Śāntideva urges his readers to walk with a downcast gaze, as if continually meditating, but notes that they may look outward to rest their eyes or to greet someone. One should look ahead (or behind) before moving there, he says, and think about one’s actions before undertaking them; one should continually observe the positioning of one’s body. Each of these actions, Śāntideva specifies, allows one to restrain the mind (BCA V.35-40). Similarly, one should avoid idle chatter, or purposeless nervous tics (BCA V.45-6). In general, as Susanne Mrozik notes, “Close careful attention to one’s bodily movements and gestures generates mindfulness and awareness. Disciplining the body is thus a means of disciplining one’s thoughts and feelings” (Mrozik 1998, 63).

Śāntideva notes that the relationship between good conduct and meditative concentration is two-way: “One aiming at meditative concentration should have good conduct, for mindfulness and introspection; so too, one aiming at good conduct should make effort at meditative concentration.” He claims that the “complete perfection of mental action” will comes from the two “mutually enhancing causes” that are good conduct and meditative concentration (ŚS 121).

The second half of the fifth BCA chapter involves details about bodily comportment which aim at pleasing others, rather than at focusing the mind; similar instructions are found in the sixth chapter of the ŚS. It is possible, though not clear, that Śāntideva also intends these to be included under good conduct. Śāntideva here enjoins etiquette of various kinds (do not spit in public, do not make noises while eating) and a pleasant tone of speaking (BCA V.71-96, ŚS 124-7). Mrozik (2007, 75-6) notes that such actions are intended to generate prasāda, a kind of peaceful pleasure, in those who observe the bodhisattva. Lele (2007, 151-9) suggests further that the goal of generating this prasāda is to attract them to the bodhisattva path, making them more likely to enter that path and increase their well-being.

c. Patient Endurance

Śāntideva divides patient endurance (kṣānti) into three major varieties: first, enduring suffering (duṣkhâdhivāsanakṣānti); second, dharmic patience, the patient endurance that comes from reflecting on the Buddha’s teaching, the dharma (dharmanidhyānakṣānti); and third, patience toward others’ wrongdoing (parâpakāramarṣanakṣānti, ŚS 179). The first, which Śāntideva opposes to frustration (daurmanasya), is closer to the English word “endurance”; the third, which Śāntideva opposes to anger (dveṣa), is closer to the English word “patience.” For this reason it is helpful to use a two-word term like “patient endurance” to encapsulate the idea of kṣānti as a whole. Śāntideva does not link these phenomena under the rubric of patient endurance merely for the sake of convenience or etymology; rather, patient endurance has common elements that pervade them all. In all three cases, one remains calm and even happy in the face of various undesired events — pains, frustrations, wrongs — that one might face.

Dharmic patience, the second variety — as Śāntideva describes it in BCA VI.22-32 — is juxtaposed against anger, and involves being patient with others’ bad actions. For this reason, it seems largely like a subtype of the third type, patience toward wrongdoing, which involves reflecting on the fact that their actions all have causes. Śāntideva likely treats the two as distinct in order to emphasize the particular importance of metaphysical reasons for patient endurance. In terms of the actions and mental dispositions that they entail, they do not appear to be different from each other. So we may here subsume this second variety under the third, except as otherwise specified.

There are at least two ways in which enduring suffering and patience toward wrongdoing are closely related in Śāntideva's work. First, there is a logical or analytical relationship. When one is wronged by others, it is likely to be an undesired event, and therefore experienced as suffering. So, effectively, the events that evoke patience toward wrongdoing are a subset of those that evoke the endurance of  suffering. The appropriate reactions are intertwined as well. We see this when Śāntideva discusses being the victim of theft. While he addresses theft in the context of anger, and more generally of patience toward wrongdoing, the reason he gives to remain patient is that possessions are dangerous to have anyway (BCA VI.100) — a central part of Śāntideva's justifications for nonattachment, which itself is very closely tied to enduring suffering.

Second, there is a causal relationship. Enduring suffering, as Śāntideva discusses it, requires that one fight frustration; patience toward wrongdoing requires that one fight anger. And both of Śāntideva's texts (ŚS 179 and BCA VI.7-8) note that anger feeds on frustration; so enduring suffering makes it easier to have patience toward wrongdoing.

i. Happiness from Enduring Suffering

Śāntideva's case for enduring suffering is relatively straightforward: one will feel less suffering and be happier. Early in his discussion of frustration (daurmanasya), Śāntideva makes the pragmatic point that it accomplishes little. So it is not only an unpleasant mental state, but an unnecessary one: “If indeed there is a remedy, then what’s the point of frustration? And if there is no remedy, then what’s the point of frustration?” (BCA VI.10).

Enduring suffering can lead to happiness, for Śāntideva, in a particularly extreme meditative state (samādhi). He refers to this state as the sarvadharmasukhakrānta, “making happiness toward all phenomena.” The passage describing this meditative state is one of the most provocative in the entire ŚS. Śāntideva says that “for a bodhisattva who has obtained this meditative state, with respect to all sense objects, pain is felt as happiness indeed, not as suffering or as indifference” (ŚS 181). He proceeds to describe a panoply of graphic tortures in a startlingly upbeat manner. For example:

[The bodhisattva who has attained this meditative state], while being fried in oil, or while pounded like pounded sugarcane, or while crushed like a reed, or while being burned in the way that oil or ghee or yogurt are burned — has a happy thought arisen. (ŚS 181)

While a reader might cringe at the literal masochism in this passage, it is also not hard to see the power of its appeal: It strongly suggests that a bodhisattva can be happy anywhere, any time, in any condition. And there is a particular practice that the bodhisattva pursues to reach this state. Whenever he is subjected to such an unpleasant fate, he makes a mental determination or vow (pranidhāna) that everyone, from those who honor him to those who torture him, should reach the great awakening (ŚS 182). In the BCA he suggests starting with small pains to learn to endure bigger ones: “because of the practice of mild distress, even great distress is tolerable” (BCA VI.14). Prajñākaramati draws a direct connection between the two, quoting the ŚS passage in his commentary on the BCA verse.

ii. The Case Against Anger

Śāntideva's arguments for patience toward wrongdoing consist of arguments against anger, against which this patience is juxtaposed. He lays out these arguments primarily in the sixth chapter of the BCA; for a detailed commentary on this chapter, see Thurman 2004. His arguments here derive from premises both naturalistic and supernaturalistic: “One who destroys anger is happy in this world and the next” (BCA VI.6).

Śāntideva's naturalistic arguments against anger rest first on psychological grounds: “The mind does not get peace, nor enjoy pleasure and happiness, nor find sleep or satisfaction, when the dart of anger rests in the heart” (BCA VI.3). This set of psychological claims has a strong intuitive plausibility, in our context as well as his; it is probably not difficult for anyone to remember times that anger has negatively affected her peace of mind or pleasure or sleep.

Beyond this, Śāntideva seeks to minimize the significance of others’ wrongdoing (apakāra). He is especially concerned to neutralize insults and the destruction of praise. He asks: “The gang of contempt, harsh speech and infamy does not bind my body. Why, O mind, do you get enraged by it?” (BCA VI.53)

Śāntideva also offers severe warnings concerning the karmic consequences of anger. There is no bad karma equal to anger, he says, so patient endurance is the most effective means to reduce bad karma (BCA VI.2). He warns that anger leads to suffering in the hell realms far greater than the suffering that originally provoked the anger:

If suffering merely here and now cannot be endured, why is anger, the cause of distress in hell, not restrained? In the same way, for the sake of anger I have been placed in hells thousands of times; I have done this neither for my own sake nor for anyone else’s. (BCA VI.73-4)

There is only one kind of anger that Śāntideva seems to approve of, effectively an exception that proves the rule. He approves of anger when it is directed at anger itself: “Let anger toward anger be my choice” (BCA VI.41). More generally, he suggests elsewhere that anger at “my enemies, craving, anger and so on” (BCA IV.28) might be valuable: “Lodged in my own mind, these well-stood ones still harm me. In this very case I do not get angry. Damn, what unsuitable patience (sahiṣṇutā)!” (BCA IV.29).

Śāntideva also makes the case for dharmic patience (dharmanidhyānakṣānti) in BCA VI.22-32; this, as mentioned earlier, is patience toward wrongdoing which is informed by metaphysical insight. Śāntideva's point here is that the emotion of anger comes out of an incorrect belief about the world — namely that other agents can appropriately be blamed for their actions. “I have no anger at my bile and so on, though they make great suffering. Why is there anger at sentient beings? They too are angry due to a cause” (BCA VI.22). Anger, whether my own or another’s, has its causes. It is not chosen; it is merely another product of the universe’s dependent arising (BCA VI.23-26). Moreover, there is no self which is capable of being an agent of anger (BCA VI.27-30). And “therefore, whether one has seen an enemy or a friend doing something wrong, having considered that the act has causes, one should become happy” (BCA VI.33). Mark Siderits (2005) refers to this argument for dharmic patience as “paleo-compatibilist,” and suggests that it can help resolve contemporary debates on free will and determinism.

These arguments against anger are phrased in terms that could convince someone not already on the path. Other arguments are directed specifically at bodhisattvas. As has been mentioned before, it is crucial for the bodhisattva to win beings over; and anger interferes with this activity, where desire (rāga) might be able on some occasions to help with it. This is why anger, in Śāntideva's eyes, is far worse than desire, though desire and anger are both afflictions (kleṣas) that cloud the mind and lead one on to suffering (ŚS 164).

He claims further that “bodhisattvas who are not excellent in means (upāyakuśala) fear downfalls connected with desire (rāga); bodhisattvas who are excellent in means fear downfalls connected with anger, not downfalls connected with desire” (ŚS 164-5). Excellence in means (upāyakauśalya), the ability to teach others in the appropriate way to bring them onto the path, is deeply hindered by anger. Unlike desire, anger has no saving graces. Anger both creates suffering for oneself and interferes with one’s ability to benefit others; this is why nothing is as karmically bad as anger, or as karmically good as patient endurance.

d. Heroic Strength

Śāntideva devotes relatively little attention to the fourth perfection, heroic strength (vīrya). Each of his texts has a short chapter (BCA VII and ŚS X) devoted to it; parallel discussions occur in the fourth chapter of the BCA. He defines heroic strength as “excellent effort” (kuśalotsaha, BCA VII.2), effort that is both skillful and virtuous — a tireless striving on the bodhisattva path. In BCA VII, he contrasts heroic strength with laziness (ālasya, BCA VII.3). The primary point of BCA VII is to insist on the urgency of the bodhisattva’s task. It is rare to be born as a human, and a short human life leaves one with little time for adequate spiritual development, so it is crucial to devote oneself wholeheartedly to the task.

ŚS X, the shortest chapter in the text — a mere four pages — explains the importance of listening to sacred texts (śruta). The topic is surprising, since it seems tangentially related, at best, to the more straightforward heroic strength addressed in BCA VII. The connection seems to be that, to listen to sacred texts properly, one must do so tirelessly. If one does not do so, Śāntideva claims, even a sacred text can lead to  "destruction" (vināśa), probably because one reads and applies the text too selectively (ŚS 189).

e. Meditation

The fifth perfection, discussed in BCA VIII and ŚS XI-XIII, is meditation (dhyāna). Meditation for Śāntideva is very much an intellectual and even philosophical exercise, not merely a stilling of the mind; some of Śāntideva's most famous arguments appear in a context of discussions of meditation. Śāntideva emphasizes that a calming and stilling of the mind is essential to meditation, and enjoins his reader to flee society and find a solitary spot in the wilderness in order to achieve the proper degree of undistracted calm (BCA VIII.1-40, ŚS 193-201). But becoming calm and solitary, in both texts, is only the first step to grasping arguments and transformative techniques with an explicit cognitive content.

In the BCA, the first meditation that Śāntideva describes sharpens his emphasis on solitude: one considers the foulness of the human body. Specifically, his male audience is urged to reflect on the foulness of a potential female lover. He notes that the beloved will invariably become a corpse, highlights the repulsiveness of corpses, and asks the reader rhetorically why the living beloved seems any less repulsive (VIII.41-7). He then calls attention to the repulsiveness of the body’s waste products, natural smells, and fluids (VIII.48-71). Next he notes the great effort one must take in finding and keeping a lover, and the ultimate vanity of such efforts (VIII.72-83).

This meditation takes on a strongly misogynist tone, describing as it does the repulsiveness of female bodies. A contemporary reader should keep in mind its intent as a critique of lust, the passion which so easily distracts the mind from the bodhisattva’s path. While the argument is phrased in terms of the foulness of a woman’s body, its logic would apply equally well to the foulness of a man’s body, if imagined by a heterosexual female or homosexual male meditator. (Śāntideva never inverts the argument this way himself. As Wilson 1996 notes, historically Buddhists have never turned the arguments about female foulness around to have it apply to men, even when speaking to a female audience. The point is noted here to stress the relevance of these meditations for a contemporary philosophical audience, rightly skeptical of misogynistic claims.) The ideal to achieve in this lifetime, for Śāntideva, is that of a male or female monk who forswears lust and sexuality, and he calls attention to the body’s repulsive aspects in order to convince his readers of this ideal’s value.

i. Equalization of Self and Other

The two meditations which follow in BCA VIII, on the relationship between oneself and another, are Śāntideva's most famous. The first of these is known as the equalization of self and other (parātmasamatā). In this meditation Śāntideva argues for an ethical conclusion from a metaphysical premise: because the self is empty and unreal, it makes little sense to protect only oneself from suffering and not others.

The arguments are framed against a hypothetical objector (pūrvapakṣin) who wishes to prevent only his own suffering, but not that of others. Suffering here has a strong normative force; that suffering is bad and worthy of prevention is taken as self-evident, and Śāntideva assumes that his readers will share that assumption. When an imagined objector asks why suffering should be prevented at all, he responds, “No one disputes that!” (BCA VIII.103) If we substitute “the absence of suffering” for “pleasure,” Śāntideva's claim here seems to work like Alasdair MacIntyre’s interpretation of Mill’s claim that we know pleasure is desirable because men desire it:

He treats the thesis that all men desire pleasure as a factual assertion which guarantees the success of an ad hominem apeal to anyone who denies his conclusion. If anyone denies that pleasure is desirable, then we can ask him, But don’t you desire it? and we know in advance that he must answer yes, and consequently must admit that pleasure is desirable. (MacIntyre 1966, 239)

To deny that suffering should be prevented at all, in other words, is to argue in bad faith: anyone who makes such a claim does not really believe it. It is not hard to see the intuitive force of Śāntideva's claim about suffering; while one might come up with exceptions, in general most human beings in most contexts have viewed suffering as something bad and undesirable.

The selfish objector is right, then, to believe that suffering should be prevented. Where he goes awry is in focusing only on his own suffering; this focus turns out to be absurd. There is no self that endures from moment to moment, so one’s own future self is as different from one’s present self as other beings are: “If [someone else] is not protected because his suffering cannot hurt me — the sufferings of a future body are not mine. Why is that hurt protected against?” (BCA VIII.97) Śāntideva's arguments here have been compared to those of Derek Parfit (1984), who also attacks the metaphysical premise of selfhood as a premise for an altruistic ethics.

Paul Williams (1998a, 30) notes that most commentators, including Prajñākaramati, have read this verse so that the “future body” (āgāmikāya) means only the bodies one will inhabit in future rebirths, not the future state of one’s body in the present life. A literal reading of this verse and the next would suggest that they are right; the next verse adds that “one is dead, a very different other one is born” (BCA VIII.98). So Williams thinks that “from a textual point of view” this verse must be correct. However, later Tibetan commentators, especially rGyal tshab rje, interpret the verse so that it could refer to any present suffering one might try to prevent (Williams 1998a, 32-6). The “death” and “birth” would likely then refer to the body’s non-enduring nature — dying as the present moment passes away and being born anew in the following moment — rather than to literal death and rebirth. Logically this seems a more satisfying reading. The argument seems entirely superfluous if it refers only to future births; based on everything else that Śāntideva says, one concerned with better future births should, above all, prevent the suffering of others.

Śāntideva makes an additional argument beyond the point about future selves. Even the present self should be broken up into its parts. When the opponent objects that one who suffers should only prevent the suffering that belongs to him, Śāntideva retorts: “The foot’s suffering is not the hand’s. Why does [the hand] protect [the foot]?” (BCA VIII.99)

Williams (1998b) has attempted to refute Śāntideva's arguments against egoism, claiming that the concept of suffering or pain makes little sense without a subject or self to feel the suffering. Williams’s refutation has been controversial, provoking Barbra Clayton (Clayton 2001), John Pettit (1999) and Mark Siderits (Siderits 2000) all to defend Śāntideva's claims.

Why do these arguments appear in the chapter on meditation, when the primary focus of that chapter seems to concern the kind of metaphysical insight that is the topic of the following chapter? Two reasons suggest themselves. First, the arguments prepare the audience for the more imaginatively focused practice of the exchange and self and other. Second, as Crosby and Skilton suggest(1995, 84-5), these meditations derive from Cittamātra (Yogācāra) metaphysical views on the ultimate equivalence of self and other.   Śāntideva considers these Cittamātra views to be only a step on the road to the highest Madhyamaka view (see BCA IX). These arguments, then,  are really true only at the level of conventional truth, not at the level of wordless ultimate reality, the object of real metaphysical insight.

ii. Exchange of Self and Other

The last meditation in the chapter is called the exchange of self and other (parātmaparivartana). In it, Śāntideva attempts to put the equalization of self and other into practice, even taking it a step further to dissolve all the meditator’s vestiges of egoism. Here he urges his readers to create “a sense of self in inferiors and others, and a sense of other in oneself,” (VIII.140) to literally form a concept of “I” (ahamkāra) with respect to others, just as one would do with respect to the “drops of semen and blood” (VIII.158) which created the entity that one would normally consider a self. The intervening verses manifest this idea in practice. Here Śāntideva switches pronouns and grammatical persons so that the third person refers to the meditator and the first person to “others.” The new “I” that is the others can then feel envy and contempt toward the “he” that was oneself.

One now imagines how “he” — that is, oneself — seems happy, wealthy and praised, while “I” — others — “am” miserable, poor and despised; “I” should envy “him” (BCA VIII.141-2). Having imagined oneself from the viewpoint of an envious inferior, one then imagines the inverse viewpoint of a contemptuous superior:

We joyous ones see him finally mistreated, and the mocking laughter of all the people here and there. That wretch even had a rivalry with me! . . . Even if he were to have wealth, we should take it forcibly, having given him a mere pittance, if he does any work for us. And he should be caused to fall from happiness. (BCA VIII.150-4)

This sadomasochistic advice and the play of pronouns work together to end  feelings of egoism or attachment to self. Meditating in this way, one comes to live entirely for others.

iii. Meditations Against the Three Poisons

The above meditations from the BCA, while Śāntideva's most famous, are not the only meditations that he prescribes. In the ŚS, after briefly advising solitude and the control of thoughts, Śāntideva presents in turn three meditations intended to counter the three mental “poisons” which, in Buddhist thought, are responsible for suffering: desire (rāga), anger (dveṣa) and delusion (moha).

Against desire, Śāntideva describes a meditation on the foulness of the body, as in the BCA (ŚS 209-12).  To counteract anger, Śāntideva prescribes the practice of friendliness or love (maitrī, ŚS 212-19). This practice takes a number of forms, but the most notable is the redirection (parināmanā) of good karma toward others’ benefit. (This will be discussed below under “good and bad karma.”) Such acts are discussed at a number of places in Śāntideva's texts; at ŚS 213-16 he specifically refers to the practice of friendliness, which is intended to counteract anger. The way that one redirects good karma, in practice, is through an expressly stated wish: for example, “Whoever is suffering distress of body or mind in any of the ten directions — may they obtain oceans of happiness and joy through my good karma” (BCA X.2). This rationale for karmic redirection could apply even to those skeptical whether a supernatural process of karmic causality will actually work: by regularly wishing that one’s own good deeds will benefit others’ well-being, one can at least diminish the anger that one feels toward them.

Finally, to counteract delusion, one meditates on dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda), the Buddhist theory that all things come to exist in dependence upon other causes (ŚS 219-28). This meditation leads into Śāntideva's discussion of the final perfection, metaphysical insight.

f. Metaphysical Insight

The sixth and final perfection in Śāntideva's thought is prajñā, a complex term which this article renders as “metaphysical insight.” The term “insight” emphasizes the depth and transformative nature of this knowledge — as we will see, Śāntideva makes strong claims about the effects that prajñā has on its possessor, so that it is classified as a perfection alongside patient endurance and restrained good conduct. The term “metaphysical” emphasizes the specific content of this knowledge: claims about the nature of reality. This is a relatively loose and nontechnical sense of the term “metaphysics” that one may find in introductory textbooks on philosophy — for example, “Metaphysics is the attempt to say what reality is” (Solomon 2006, 113). This section begins with a discussion of the ideas and arguments that Śāntideva includes as the content of metaphysical insight, and then proceeds to discuss their significance for ethics and the conduct of life.

i. Content

Śāntideva's views on metaphysics follow those of the Madhyamaka school of thought, associated with Nāgārjuna. (See Nagarjuna and Madhyamaka Buddhism for more detail.) For Madhyamaka, all things, especially the self, are empty (śūnya) and dependently originated (pratītyasamutpanna) — they have no essential or abiding existence. Tibetan tradition has typically associated Śāntideva with the more radical Prāsangika Mādhyamika school, as his metaphysical arguments follow their approach of reductio ad absurdum (prasanga) argument rather than the independent syllogisms (svatantra) of the Svātantrika school. On the other hand, Akira Saito (1996, 261) has argued that “we cannot be too careful” in using the term Prāsangika with reference to Śāntideva.  (See McClintock and Dreyfus 2002 for a discussion of the distinction between the Prāsangika and Svātantrika schools.)

Śāntideva's metaphysics is widely studied and commented on, both in Tibetan tradition and in the West. (For Tibetan commentaries see Dalai Lama XIV 1988; Palden and Seunam 1993. For Western commentaries see Oldmeadow 1994; Sweet 1977.) Nevertheless, the content of Śāntideva's metaphysics does not seem particularly original; as Michael Sweet’s book-length study of Śāntideva's metaphysics notes,

we do not find that his philosophical concerns or patterns of argumentation differ in any significant manner from those of Nāgārjuna, and especially from those of Candrakīrti, the great systematizer of the Prāsangika-Mādhyamika who preceded Śāntideva by at least a century. (Sweet 1977, 14)

Where Śāntideva's approach innovates is in the way that he draws ethical conclusions directly from his metaphysical premises. Many Buddhist texts draw soteriological conclusions of some sort from metaphysical premises — the nature of the universe is such that everyday life is filled with suffering but one can be liberated from it. Moreover, texts often draw ethical conclusions from these soteriological ideas. So in earlier texts there is an indirect connection from metaphysics to ethics by way of soteriology. Śāntideva, on the other hand, argues directly from metaphysics to advice about conduct in life, in a way that is relatively unusual in South Asian Buddhist literature. One exception is Candrakīrti himself, who derives ethical conclusions from metaphysics in his Catuhṣataka commentary (see Lang 2003), though his approach to doing so is significantly different from Śāntideva's.

Śāntideva's prasanga arguments avoid foundational claims, in the stricter sense of attempts to definitively establish a position from which other claims can be deduced. Any such position would itself be considered empty and therefore in some sense flawed. Indeed, an earlier Madhyamaka text, the Vigrahavyāvartani of Nāgārjuna, famously refuted its opponents by proclaiming: “If I had any position, then I would have a flaw [in my argument]. But I have no position; therefore I have no flaw at all” (VV 29). Rather, the approach is intended to be purely dialectical and critical, examining alternative positions and knocking them down, as Śāntideva does in BCA IX. Because Śāntideva is deconstructing concepts and deriving ethical significance from this deconstruction, William Edelglass (2007) compares his philosophy to that of Emmanuel Lévinas.

Claims to have no position may seem absurd at first glance, especially when associated with a thinker like Śāntideva who seems to make many positive claims about how one should live. Śāntideva's response relies on the central Madhyamaka distinction between conventional (samvriti) and ultimate (paramārtha) truth (e.g. BCA IX.2). The ultimate truth is inexpressible (anabhilāpya), untaught (adeṣita) and unmanifest (aprakāśita, ŚS 256); it is nonconceptual, and therefore nonrational. But because we are caught up in illusion, seeing substance, we still need to make provisional statements at a conventional level to make ourselves and others aware of this illusion and free ourselves from it. Since the ultimate truth is inexpressible, all of Śāntideva's actual claims need to be understood at the conventional level.

The above is what Śāntideva appears to say in his own words, at any rate. It is worth noting here that the Tibetan dGe lugs (Geluk) school argues that such claims cannot be taken literally and that in fact the ultimate truth is accessible to the intellect, although other commentators from the Sa skya (Sakya) and rNying ma (Nyingma) schools accept a more literal interpretation like the one I have just provided (Sweet 1977, 20).

The distinction between ultimate and conventional truth lends support to a number of Śāntideva's practical arguments. Especially, it supports his self-interested case for altruism on the grounds of the bodhisattva’s happiness: “All who are suffering in the world [are suffering] because of desire for their own happiness. All who are happy in the world [are happy] because of desire for others’ happiness” (BCA VIII.129). Śāntideva does not explain how this psychological claim is supposed to work. Lele (2007, 65-6) ties the claim to Śāntideva's theory of nonattachment (aparigraha); concern for oneself and one’s own particular interests leads to painful feelings of grief, loss, and fear when, as inevitably happens, those interests are harmed. But however such arguments are supposed to work, they would seem to be undercut by another claim of Śāntideva's: namely, that bodhisattvas still suffer in a sense, because of their compassion for others. He claims: “Just as one whose body is on fire has no joy at all, even through all pleasures, exactly so there is no way to joy with respect to the distress of beings, for those made of compassion” (BCA VI.123; see also ŚS 156, 166).

The distinction between conventional and ultimate, however, helps one resolve this apparent problem -- for the claim that bodhisattvas suffer is made merely at the conventional level of truth. Śāntideva argues that suffering itself is unreal (BCA IX.88-91); and only one who realizes the ultimate truth, it seems, will be able to really recognize this unreality. This recognition is the way in which it is possible for suffering to end, as the Third Noble Truth of Buddhism promises. It is also probably part of the reason that Śāntideva proclaims that happy people are happy because they desire others’ happiness — a bodhisattva, who has lost the illusion of self, can also lose the illusion of suffering and thereby escape it.

If suffering is unreal, however, one may wonder why it should be prevented. A similar worry applies to good and bad karma. Śāntideva claims, after all, that good and bad karma themselves arise out of illusion (BCA IX.11); like everything else we can speak of, they are ultimately empty. Clayton (2006, 97-8) argues that this point implies that ethical action, good karma, or eliminating suffering are unnecessary or insignificant. She quotes Richard Hayes (1994, 38) to the effect that maintaining a sense of the importance of ethics in such a philosophy is merely “philosophical rigour and integrity being compromised by the perceived need to preserve a social institution.” She finds herself “not quite cynical enough” to doubt Śāntideva's sincerity in accordance with Hayes’s quote, but provides no alternative explanation for why Śāntideva might have still believed in ethical action. Lele (2007, 89-90) argues to the contrary that Śāntideva maintains his philosophical integrity through the conventional-ultimate distinction. Ultimately good and bad karma are unreal, but they are very real at the conventional level. Most people remain trapped in the conventional level, where suffering occurs, and so they experience the suffering as real. For them, it is this conventional level of truth that matters.

ii. Practical Implications

Metaphysical insight has three major ethical and soteriological implications for Śāntideva, some of which we have already seen. First, knowing the nonexistence of self will lead one to benefit others. Second, one who knows dependent origination can become more patient with others’ wrongdoing, because he will know to avoid blaming them. Finally, “one who knows emptiness is not emotionally attached to worldly phenomena, because he is independent [of them]” (ŚS 264); recognizing the emptiness of things allows one to attach less significance to them.

These implications, for Śāntideva, are not merely a matter of logical implication. There is also a practical, cause-and-effect relationship between one’s realization of the metaphysical claims and one’s actions and mental states. For this reason Luis Gómez (1994, 121) notes that the closing verses of BCA IX “leave no room for doubt that we are dealing with a technology of the self” which is also a philosophical discourse. The passage quoted above does not merely state that one who knows emptiness also knows that he should not be emotionally attached to worldly phenomena; it states further that he himself is not in fact so attached (na samhriyate). Elsewhere in the text Śāntideva makes other, similar, causal claims that metaphysical insight will cause one to feel and act differently. For example, after having made a series of logical arguments for the equivalence of self and other, he immediately comes to add: “Those whose mental dispositions are developed in this way (evam), for whom the suffering of others is equal to their loves, go down into the Avīci hell like geese [into] a lotus pond” (BCA VIII.107, emphasis added). The "in this way" (Sanskrit evam) indicates that the logical arguments themselves are a way to develop mental dispositions; hearing these arguments is the thing that develops one’s mind to treat others’ suffering equally to one’s own. Metaphysical insight is not merely an idea added to a stock of knowledge, with which one can do as one pleases; it has direct consequences for one’s emotional states.

Such a view seems perplexing to contemporary Western ears, including some informed by Buddhism. Understanding ideas often seems not to have this liberating effect. David Burton puts the problem well, in terms of his personal experience:

I do not seem to be ignorant about the impermanence of entities. I appear to understand that entities have no fixed essence and that they often change in disagreeable ways. I seem to understand that what I possess will fall out of my possession. I apparently accept that all entities must pass away. And I seem to acknowledge that my craving causes suffering. Yet I am certainly not free from craving and attachment. . . . How, then, might one preserve the common Buddhist claim that knowledge of the three characteristics of existence [i.e. nonself, impermanence and suffering] results in liberation in the face of this objection? (Burton 2004, 31)

Burton explores several potential hypotheses to resolve his question. He labels the hypothesis which seems to come closest to Śāntideva's view as “insufficient attentiveness and reflection.” That is, that for those who have not experienced the beneficial ethical, emotional or soteriological consequences that are presumed to accrue from knowledge of Buddhist ideas, their belief in such ideas “is something they have thought about from time to time perhaps, but they do not bring it to mind often enough” (Burton 2004, 48-9).

Śāntideva suggests such a hypothesis in two ways. First, he frequently mentions the shifting and changing nature of the mind; for example, he notes that the mind is “like a river flow, unstable, broken up and dissolved when produced,” and “like lightning, unsteadily cut off in a moment” (ŚS 234). Second, within the chapter of the BCA on metaphysical insight, he speaks of “cultivating,” or meditating on, arguments: “this reasoning (vicāra) is meditated on as an antidote to that [fixation on imagination]” (BCA IX.92). This point is reinforced elsewhere in the text; as we have seen, his most famous metaphysical argument, on the equivalence of self and other (BCA VIII.90-119), occurs in the context of a particular meditation, within the BCA’s chapter on meditation (dhyāna). It is not enough, for Śāntideva, to find an argument persuasive and then move on to other things; it must be fixed in one’s mind.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

BCA --- Śāntideva, Bodhicaryāvatāra. Edition: Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati; ed. P.L. Vaidya (1960), Buddhist Sanskrit Texts XII, Darbhanga, India: Mithila Institute. References given are to chapter and verse numbers.

BCAP --- Prajñākaramati, Bodhicaryāvatārapañjikā. Edition: Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati; ed. P.L. Vaidya (1960), Buddhist Sanskrit Texts XII, Darbhanga, India: Mithila Institute. Page references given are to the Poussin edition (listed with “P” in the Vaidya edition’s margins).

NE --- Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics. Edition: J. Bywater, available for download and online search at as of 14 Aug 2007.

ŚS --- Śāntideva, Śikṣāsamuccaya. Edition: Çikshāsamuccaya: a compendium of Buddhistic teachings, compiled by Çāntideva chiefly from earlier Mahāyāna sūtras; ed. Cecil Bendall (1970), Bibliotheca Buddhica I, Osnabruck, Germany: Biblio Verlag.

ŚSK --- Śāntideva, Śikṣāsamuccaya Kārikā, in the Bendall edition of the ŚS above.

VV --- Nāgārjuna, Vigrahavyāvartani. Edition: Vigrahavyāvartani of Nāgārjuna: Sanskrit Text, eds. Christian Lindtner and Richard Mahoney (2003), available for download at as of 14 Aug 2007.

b. Translations Cited

  • Bendall, Cecil. 1970. Introduction. In Çikshāsamuccaya: A Compendium of Buddhistic Teaching Compiled By Çāntideva Chiefly From Earlier Mahāyāna-Sūtras. Osnabrück: Biblio Verlag.
  • Crosby, Kate, and Andrew Skilton. 1995. The Bodhicaryāvatāra: A New Translation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wallace, Vesna A., and B. Alan Wallace, eds. 1997. A Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.

c. General Studies of Śāntideva

  • Brassard, Francis. 2000. The Concept of Bodhicitta in Śāntideva's Bodhicaryāvatāra. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Clayton, Barbra. 2006. Moral Theory in Śāntideva's Śikṣāsamuccaya: Cultivating the Fruits of Virtue. London and New York: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Cooper, David E., ed. 1998. Ethics: The Classic Readings. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Dayal, Har. 1970. The Bodhisattva Doctrine in Buddhist Sanskrit Literature. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Griffiths, Paul J. 1999. Religious Reading: The Place of Reading in the Practice of Religion. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press.
  • Gyatso, Geshe Kelsang. 1986. Meaningful to Behold: A Commentary to Shantideva's Guide to the Bodhisattva's Way of Life. London: Tharpa Publications.
  • Harvey, Peter. 2000. An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics: Foundations, Values and Issues. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hedinger, Jürg. 1984. Aspekte der Schulung in der Laufbahn eines Bodhisattva: Dargestellt nach dem Śikṣāsamuccaya des Śāntideva. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • Lele, Amod. 2007. Ethical Revaluation in the Thought of Śāntideva. Unpublished PhD dissertation, Harvard University.
  • Mahoney, Richard. 2002. Of the Progress of the Bodhisattva: The Bodhisattvamārga in the Śikṣāsamuccaya. University of Canterbury.
  • Pezzali, Amalia. 1968. Śāntideva: Mystique Bouddhiste Des Viie Et Viiie Siècles. Florence: Vallecchi Editore.
  • Rinpoche, Thrangu. 2002. A Guide to the Bodhisattva's Way of Life of Shantideva: A Commentary. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications.
  • Tobden, Geshe Yeshe. 2005. The Way of Awakening: A Commentary on Shantideva's Bodhicharyavatara. Somerville, MA: Wisdom.
  • Williams, Paul. 1995. General Introduction: Śāntideva and His World. In The Bodhicaryāvatāra. Ed. Kate Crosby, and Andrew Skilton, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

d. Specialized Studies

  • Clayton, Barbra. 2001. Compassion as a Matter of Fact: The Argument From No-Self to Selflessness in Śāntideva's Śikṣāsamuccaya. Contemporary Buddhism 2 (1): 83-97.
  • Dalai Lama XIV. 1988. Transcendent Wisdom: A Commentary on the Ninth Chapter of Śāntideva's Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.
  • de Jong, J.W. 1975. La légende de Śāntideva. Indo-Iranian Journal 16 (3): 161-82.
  • de Rachewiltz, Igor. 1996. The Mongolian Tanjur Version of the Bodhicaryāvatāra, Edited and Transcribed, With a Word-Index and a Photo-Reproduction of the Original Text (1748). Wiesbaden, Germany: Harrassowitz.
  • Edelglass, William. 2007. Ethics and the Subversion of Conceptual Reification in Lévinas and Śāntideva. In Deconstruction and the Ethical in Asian Thought. Ed. Youru Wang, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Gómez, Luis O. 1994. Presentations of Self: Personal Dimensions of Ritualized Speech. In Other Selves: Autobiography and Biography in Cross-Cultural Perspective. Ed. Phyllis Granoff, and Koichi Shinohara, Oakville, ON and Buffalo, NY: Mosaic Press.
  • Gómez, Luis O. 1999. The Way of the Translators: Three Recent Translations of Śāntideva's Bodhicaryāvatāra. Buddhist Literature 1 262-354.
  • Goodman, Charles. 2008. Consequentialism, Agent-Neutrality, and Mahāyāna Ethics. Philosophy East and West 58 (1): 17-35.
  • Harrison, Paul. 2007. The Case of the Vanishing Poet: New Light on Śāntideva and the Śikṣā-Samuccaya. In Festschrift für Michael Hahn, zum 65. Geburtstag von Freunden und Schülern Überreicht. Ed. Konrad Klaus, and Jens-Uwe Hartmann. Vienna: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien.
  • Kanaoka, S. 1963. Regional Characteristics of Mongolian Buddhism: A Study on the Basis of the "Bodhicaryāvatāra". Bukkyo Shigaku 10 (4): 15-24.
  • Palden, Khentchen Kunzang, and Minyak Kunzang Seunam. 1993. Comprendre La Vacuité: Deux Commentaires Du Chapitre Ix De La Marche Vers L'éveil De Shāntideva. Peyzac-le-Moustier, France: Éditions Padmakara.
  • Mrozik, Susanne. 1998. The Relationship Between Morality and the Body in Monastic Training According to the Śikṣāsamuccaya. Harvard University.
  • Mrozik, Susanne. 2007. Virtuous Bodies: The Physical Dimensions of Morality in Buddhist Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Oldmeadow, P.R. 1994. A Study of the Wisdom Chapter (Prajñāparamitā Pariccheda) of the Bodhicaryāvatārapañjikā of Prajñākaramati. Australian National University.
  • Onishi, Kaoru. 2003. The Bodhicaryāvatāra and Its Monastic Aspects: On the Problem of Representation. University of Michigan.
  • Pettit, John. 1999. Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicharyavatara. Journal of Buddhist Ethics 6.
  • Saito, Akira. 1993. A Study of Akṣayamati (=Śāntideva)'s Bodhisattvacaryāvatāra as Found in the Tibetan Manuscripts From Tun-Huang. Faculty of Humanities, Miye University.
  • Saito, Akira. 1996. Śāntideva in the History of Mādhyamika Philosophy. In Buddhism in India and Abroad: An Integrating Influence in Vedic and Post-Vedic Perspective. Ed. Kalpakam Sankarnarayan, Motohiro Yoritomi, and Shubhada A. Joshi. Mumbai: Somaiya Publications Pvt. Ltd.
  • Siderits, Mark. 2000. The Reality of Altruism: Reconstructing Śāntideva. Philosophy East and West 50 (3): 412-24.
  • Siderits, Mark. 2005. Freedom, Caring and Buddhist Philosophy. Contemporary Buddhism 6 (2): 87-113.
  • Sweet, Michael J. 1977. Śāntideva and the Mādhyamika: The Prajñāpāramitā-Pariccheda of the Bodhicaryāvatāra. University of Wisconsin-Madison.
  • Sweet, Michael J. 1996. Mental Purification (Blo Sbyong): A Native Tibetan Genre of Religious Literature. In Tibetan Literature: Studies in Genre. Ed. José Ignacio Cabezón, and Roger R. Jackson. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.
  • Thurman, Robert A.F. 2004. Anger: The Seven Deadly Sins. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Paul. 1998a. Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicaryāvatāra. Richmond, UK: Curzon Press.
  • Williams, Paul. 1998b. The Absence of Self and the Removal of Pain: How Śāntideva Destroyed the Bodhisattva Path. In Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicaryāvatāra, Richmond, UK: Curzon Press.

e. Related Interest

  • Burton, David. 2004. Buddhism, Knowledge, and Liberation: A Philosophical Analysis of Suffering. Aldershot, England; Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
  • Chang, Garma C.C., ed. 1991. A Treasury of Mahāyāna Sūtras: Selections From the Mahāratnakūṭa Sūtra. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Harrison, Paul. 1987. Who Gets to Ride in the Great Vehicle? Self-Image and Identity Among Followers of the Early Mahāyāna. Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 10 (2): 67-89.
  • Hayes, Richard. 1994. The Analysis of Karma in Vasubandhu's Abhidharmakośabhāṣya. In Hermeneutical Paths to the Sacred Worlds of India. Ed. Katherine K. Young, Atlanta: Scholars Press.
  • Heim, Maria. 2004. Theories of the Gift in South Asia: Hindu, Buddhist and Jain Reflections on Dāna. New York and Oxford: Routledge.
  • Hibbets, Maria. 2000. The Ethics of Esteem. Journal of Buddhist Ethics 7 26-42.
  • Kajiyama, Yuichi. 1989. Transfer and Transformation of Merits in Relation to Emptiness. In Studies in Buddhist Philosophy (Selected Papers). Ed. Katsumi Minaki. Kyoto: Rinsen Book Co.
  • Keown, Damien. 2005. Buddhism: Morality Without Ethics? In Buddhist Studies From India to America: Essays in Honor of Charles S. Prebish. Ed. Damien Keown. London: Routledge.
  • Lang, Karen. 2003. Four Illusions: Candrakīrti's Advice to Travelers on the Bodhisattva Path. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1966. A Short History of Ethics: A History of Moral Philosophy From the Homeric Age to the Twentieth Century. New York: Touchstone.
  • McClintock, Sara, and Georges Dreyfus, eds. 2002. The Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Distinction: What Difference Does a Difference Make? Somerville, MA: Wisdom Publiccations.
  • Nattier, Jan. 2003. A Few Good Men: The Bodhisattva Path According to the Inquiry of Ugra (Ugraparipṛcchā). Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press.
  • Parfit, Derek. 1984. Reasons and Persons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pye, Michael. 1978. Skilful Means: A Concept in Mahayana Buddhism. London: Duckworth.
  • Solomon, Robert C. 2006. The Big Questions: A Short Introduction to Philosophy. Belmont, CA: Thomson Wadsworth.
  • Sprung, Mervyn. 1979. Lucid Exposition of the Middle Way: The Essential Chapters From the Prasannapadā of Candrakīrti. Boulder, CO: Prajñā Press.
  • Tatz, Mark. 1994. The Skill in Means (Upāyakauśalya) Sūtra. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Wilson, Liz. 1996. Charming Cadavers: Horrific Figurations of the Feminine in Indian Buddhist Hagiographic Literature. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Author Information

Amod Lele
Boston University

Romanization Systems for Chinese Terms

Originally, the Chinese language and its many dialects did not use any form of alphabetical writing to express the meanings and sounds of Chinese characters. As Western interest in China intensified during the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, various systems of romanization (transliteration into the Roman alphabet used in most Western languages) were proposed and utilized. Of these, the most frequently used today are the pinyin system and the Wade-Giles system. Both are based on the pronunciation of Chinese characters according to “Mandarin,” used as the official language of government in both the People’s Republic of China (mainland China) and the Republic of China (Taiwan).

The Wade-Giles system prevailed in both China and the West until the late twentieth century, at which point the pinyin system (developed in the People’s Republic of China during the 1950s) began to gain adherence among journalists and scholars. Today, the most current scholarship tends to use pinyin renderings of Chinese terms. For this reason, the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy introduces the names of Chinese philosophical concepts and figures in pinyin romanizations, with the exception of Wade-Giles forms that appear in bibliographical entries. The difference between the two systems can be compared by examining the renderings of some common Chinese philosophical terms according to each:

Pinyin Wade-Giles English Translation
Dao Tao Way, path
de te virtue, moral force, power
jing ching classic, scripture
junzi chün-tzu gentleman, profound person
ren jen benevolence, humaneness
Tian T’ien Heaven, nature
ziran tzu-jan spontaneity, naturalness

The following table may be used to convert pinyin and Wade-Giles romanizations:

Pinyin Wade-Giles Pronounce As-
b p b as in "be," aspirated
c ts', ts' ts as in "its"
ch ch' as in "church"
d t d as in "do"
g k g as in "go"
ian ien
j ch j as in "jeep"
k k' k as in "kind," aspirated
ong ung
p p' p as in "par," aspirated
q ch' ch as in "cheek"
r j approx. like "j" in French "je"
s s, ss, sz s as in "sister"
sh sh sh as in "shore"
si szu
t t' t as in "top"
x hs sh as in the "she" - thinly sounded
yi I
you yu
z ts z as in "zero"
zh ch j as in "jump"
zi tzu

Author Information

Jeffrey L. Richey
Berea College

Cheng Hao (Cheng Mingdao, 1032—1085)

Cheng_HaoCheng Hao, also known as Cheng Mingdao, was a pioneer of the neo-Confucian movement in the Song and Ming dynasties, which is often regarded as the second epoch of the development of Confucianism, with pre-Qin classical Confucianism as the first, and contemporary Confucianism as the third. If neo-Confucianism is to be understood as the learning of li (conventionally translated as “principle”), then Cheng Hao and his younger brother Cheng Yi can be regarded as the true founders of neo-Confucianism, as with them li came to be regarded as the ultimate reality of the universe for the first time in Chinese history . Cheng Hao’s unique understanding of the ultimate reality is that it is not some entity but rather is the “life-giving activity.” This understanding strikes a similar tone to Martin Heidegger’s Being of beings which was created almost a millennium later. Assuming the identity of li and human nature, Cheng Hao argues that human nature is good, since what is essential to human nature is humanity (ren), also the cardinal virtue in Confucianism, and this is nothing but this life-giving activity. A person of ren is the one who is in one body with “ten thousand things” and therefore can feel their pains and itches just as one can feel them in one’s own body. This is an idea central to the whole idealist school (xinxue, learning of heart-mind) of the neo-Confucian movement, a movement culminating in Wang Yangming.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Principle
  3. Goodness of Human Nature
  4. Origin of Evil
  5. Moral Cultivation
  6. Influence
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Cheng Hao was born in Huangpi of the present Hubei Province in Mingdao Year 1 of Emperor Ren of the Song dynasty (1032) and so is also called Mr. Mingdao. He and his younger brother Cheng Yi (1033-1107) are often referred to as “the two Chengs” by later Confucians. Growing up, the brothers moved quite often as their father, Cheng Xiang, was appointed as a local official in various places. In 1046, his father became acquainted with Zhou Dunyi (1016-1073), one of the so-called “five Confucian masters” of the Northern Song. He sent Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi – who themselves turned out to be the other two of the five masters – to study with Zhou for about a year. In 1057, after passing the civil service examination, Cheng Hao followed in his father’s footsteps and started his own career as a local official, culminating in his initial participation in (1069) and eventual withdrawal from (1070) the reform movement led by Wang Anshi (1021-1086). Cheng Hao returned to Luoyang after 1072 and continued to assume a few minor official positions, but he spent most of his time studying and teaching Confucian classics together with his brother. During this period, the brothers also had frequent discussions with the final two of the five masters, Shao Yong (1011-1077) and Zhang Zai (1020-1077). The former was their neighbor in Luoyang, and the latter was their uncle.

Cheng Hao’s philosophical ideas are largely developed in conversations with his students, many of whom recorded his sayings. In 1168, Zhu Xi (1130-1200) edited some of these recorded sayings in Chengs’ Surviving Sayings (Yishu) in 25 volumes, in which 4 volumes are attributed to Cheng Hao and 11 volumes to Cheng Yi. The first 10 volumes are sayings by the two masters, where in most cases it is not clearly indicated which saying belongs to which brother. In 1173, Zhu Xi edited Chengs’ Additional Sayings (Waishu) in 12 volumes, including those recorded sayings circulated among scholars and not included in Yishu (in most cases, it is not indicated which saying belongs to which Cheng). As Zhu Xi himself acknowledged that the authenticity of sayings in this second collection is mixed, it should be used with caution. Before Zhu Xi edited these two works, Yang Shi (1053-1135), one of the common students of the two Chengs, rewrote some of these sayings in a literary form in The Purified Words of the Two Chengs (Cuiyan). However, it mostly represents Cheng Yi’s views. Cheng Hao’s own writings, mostly official documents, letters, and poetry, are collected in the first four volumes of Chengs’ Collected Writings (Wenji). In addition, Cheng Hao wrote a correction of the Great Learning, which is included in Chengs’ Commentary on Classics (Jingshuo). All of these are now conveniently collected in the two volume edition of Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng Ji) by Zhonghua Shuju, Beijing (1981).

2. Principle

What is called neo-Confucianism in Western scholarship is most frequently called lixue, or the learning of li (commonly translated as “principle”), in Chinese scholarship. Lixue refers to neo-Confucianism in the Song and Ming (and sometimes Qing) dynasties. However, although “neo-Confucianism” was originally used to translate lixue, it is now sometimes understood more broadly than lixue to include Confucianism in the Tang Dynasty which preceded it. Cheng Hao and his younger brother Cheng Yi can be properly regarded as the founders of neo-Confucianism as the learning of principle. Although Shao Yong, Zhou Dunyi, and Zhang Zai are often also treated as neo-Confucians in this sense, it is in Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi that li first becomes the central concept in a philosophical system. Cheng Hao makes a famous claim that “although I have learned much from others, the two words tian li are what I grasped myself” (Waishu 12; 425). Tian is commonly translated as “heaven,” although it can also mean “sky” or “nature.” By combining these two words, however, Cheng Hao does not mean to emphasize that it is a principle of heaven or a heavenly principle but simply that heaven, the term traditionally used to refer to the ultimate reality, is nothing but principle (see Yishu 11; 132), and so tian li simply means “heaven-principle.” As a matter of fact, not only tian, but many other terms such as “change” (yi), dao, shen (literally “god,” but Cheng Hao focuses on its meaning of “being wonderful and unfathomable” ), “human nature” (xing), and “lord” (di) are all seen as identical to principle. For example, Cheng Hao claims that “what the heaven embodies does not have sound or smell. In terms of the reality, it is change; in terms of principle, it is dao; in terms of its function, it is god; in terms of its destiny in a human being, it is human nature” (Yishu 1; 4). “Tian is nothing but principle. We call it god to emphasize the wonderful mystery of principle in ten thousand things, just as we call it lord (di) to characterize its being the ruler of events ” (Yishu 11; 132). He even identifies it with heart-mind (xin) (Yishu 5; 76) and propriety (li). Because Cheng Hao thinks that all these terms have the same referent as principle, his philosophy is often regarded an ontological monism.

From this it becomes clear in what sense Cheng Hao claims that he grasps the meaning of tian li on his own. After all he must be aware that not only the two words separately, tian and li, but even the two words combined into one phrase, tian li, had appeared in Confucian texts before him. So what he means is that principle is understood here as the ultimate reality of the universe that has been referred to as heaven, god, lord, dao, nature, heart-mind, and change among others. In other words, with Cheng Hao “principle” acquires an ontological meaning for the first time in the Confucian tradition. Thus Cheng Hao claims that “there is only one principle under heaven, and so it is efficacious throughout the world. It has not changed since the time of three kings and remains the same between heaven and earth” (Yishu 2a; 39). In contrast, everything in the world exists because of principle. Thus Cheng Hao claims that “ten thousand things all have principle, and it is easy to follow it but difficult to go against it” (Yishu 11; 123). In other words, things prosper when principle is followed and disintegrate when it is violated. One of the most unique ideas of Cheng Hao is that ten thousand things form one body, and he tells us that “the reason that ten thousand things can be in one body is that they all have principle” (Yishu 2a; 33).

While principle is the ontological foundation of ten thousand things, Cheng Hao emphasizes that, unlike Plato’s form, it is not temporally prior to or spatially outside of ten thousand things. This can be seen from his discussion of two related pairs of ideas. The first pair is dao and concrete things (qi). After quoting from the Book of Change that “what is metaphysical (xing er shang) is called dao, while what is physical (xing er xia) is called concrete thing” (Yishu 11; 119), Cheng Hao immediately adds that “outside dao there are no things and outside things there is no dao” (Yishu 4; 73). In other words, what is metaphysical is not independent of the physical; the former is right within the latter. The second pair is principle (dao, human nature, god) and vital force (qi). In Cheng Hao’s view, “everything that is tangible is vital force, and only dao is intangible” (Yishu 6; 83). However, he emphasizes that “human nature is inseparable from vital force, and vital force is inseparable from human nature” (Yishu 1; 10), and that “there is no god (shen) outside vital force, and there is no vital force outside god” (Yishu 1; 10).

What does Cheng Hao precisely mean by principle, which is intangible and does not have sound or smell? Although translated here as “principle” according to convention, li for Cheng Hao is not a reified entity as the common essence shared by all things or universal law governing these things or inherent principle followed by these things or patterns exhibited by these things. Li as used by Cheng is a verb referring to activity, not a noun referring to thing. For example, he says that “the cold in the winter and the hot in the summer are [vital forces] yin and yang; yet the movement and change [of vital forces] is god” (Yihsu 11; 121). Since god for Cheng means the same as li, li is here understood as the movement and change of vital forces and things constituted by vital forces. Since things and li are inseparable, as li is understood as movement and change, all things are things that move and change, while movement and change are always movement and change of things. Things are tangible, have smell, and make sound, but their movement and change is intangible and does not have sound or smell. We can never perceive things’ activities, although we can perceive things that act. For example we can perceive a moving car, but we cannot perceive the car’s moving. In Cheng Hao’s view, principle as activity is present not only in natural things but also in human affairs. Thus, illustrating what he means by “nowhere between heaven and earth there is no dao” (Yishu 4; 73), Cheng points out that “in the relation of father and son, to be father and son lies in affection; in the relation of king and minister, to be king and minister lies in seriousness (reverence). From these to being husband and wife, being elder and younger brothers, being friends, there is no activity that is no dao. That is why we cannot be separated from dao even for a second” (Yishu 4; 73-74). Cheng makes it clear that the principle that governs these human relations is such activity as affection and reverence.

However, in what sense can li as activity be regarded as the ontological foundation of things, as activity is not self-existent and has to belong to something? For Cheng Hao, li is a special kind of activity. To explain this, Cheng Hao appeals to the idea of the unceasing life-giving activity (sheng sheng) from the Book of Change. Commenting on the statement that “The unceasing life-giving activity is called change” in the Book of Change, Cheng Hao argues that “it is right in this life-giving activity that li is complete” (Yishu 2a; 33). So li is the kind of activity that gives life. It is indeed in this sense of life-giving activity that Cheng Hao regards dao and tian as identical to li, as he claims that “because of this [the unceasing life-giving activity] tian can be dao. Tian is dao only because it is the life-giving activity” (Yishu 2a; 29). Thus, although life-giving activity is always the life-giving activity of ten thousand things, ten thousand things cannot come into being without the life-giving activity. It is in this sense that the life-giving activity of ten thousand things becomes ontologically prior to ten thousand things that have the life-giving activity. This is quite similar to Martin Heidegger’s ontology of Being: while Being is always the Being of beings, beings are being because of their Being.

3. Goodness of Human Nature

Since for Cheng Hao, human nature (xing) is nothing but principle destined in human beings, and since principle is nothing but life-giving activity (sheng), this life-giving activity is also human nature. It is in this sense that he speaks approvingly of Gaozi’s sheng zhi wei xing, a view criticized in the Mencius. By sheng zhi wei xing, Gaozi means that “what one is born with is nature.” Mencius criticizes this view and argues that human nature is what distinguishes human beings from non-human beings, which according to him is the beginning of four cardinal Confucian virtues: humanity (ren), rightness (yi), propriety (li), and wisdom (zhi). When Cheng Hao claims that what Gaozi says is indeed correct, however, he does not mean to disagree with Mencius. On the contrary, he endorses Mencius’ view in the same passage where he approves Gaozi’s view. This is because Cheng Hao has a very different understanding of sheng in sheng zhi wei xing than Gaozi does. For Gaozi, sheng means what one is born with, while for Cheng Hao it is the life-giving activity, which is the ultimate reality of the universe. So for Gaozi the phrase says that what humans are born with is human nature, but for Cheng Hao it means that the life-giving activity is human nature. This is most clear because Cheng Hao quotes this saying of Gaozi together with the statement from the Book of Change that “the greatest virtue of heaven and earth is the life-giving activity” and then explains this statement in his own words: “the most spectacular aspect of things is their atmosphere of life-giving activity” (Yishu 11; 120).

To understand human nature as the life-giving activity, it is important to see the actual content of human nature for Cheng Hao: “These five, humanity, rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness, are human nature. Humanity is like the complete body and the other four are like the four limbs” (Yishu 2a; 14). So his view of human nature is basically the same as Mencius, except he adds the fifth component, faithfulness. Since these five components of human nature are also five cardinal Confucian virtues, Cheng Hao talks about “virtuous human nature” (dexing) and “virtue of human nature” (xing zhi de): “ ‘virtuous nature’ indicates the worthiness of nature and so means the same thing as goodness of human nature. ‘Virtues of human nature’ refers to what human nature possesses” (Yishu 11; 125). To illustrate the goodness of human nature, Cheng Hao highlights the importance of humanity (ren), regarding it as the complete human nature that includes the other four components, because “rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness are all humanity” (2a; 16-17). For Cheng, humanity is precisely the life-giving activity. In the same passage in which he affirms Gaozi’s saying, after stating that “the atmosphere of life-giving activity is most spectacular,” Cheng Hao further makes it clear that it is humanity that continues the life-giving activity: “ ‘what is great and originating becomes (in humans) the first and chief (quality of goodness).’ This quality is known as humanity” (Yishu 11; 120). Thus, for Cheng Hao, humanity is not merely a human virtue. It is actually no different from the life-giving activity. Just like heaven, dao, god, and lord, it is indistinguishable from principle (li) as the ultimate reality.

Understood as life-giving activity, it becomes clear why human nature, which can be illustrated by humanity (as it includes other components of human nature) is good. In Cheng Hao’s view, this sense of life-giving activity that humanity (ren) has is best explained by doctors when they refer to a person who is numb as lacking ren: “doctors regard a person as not-ren when the person cannot feel pain and itch; we regard a person as lacking humanity when the person does not know, is not conscious of, and cannot recognize rightness and principle. This is the best analogy” (Yishu 2a; 33). A person whose hands and feet are numb cannot even feel the pain of oneself, to say nothing of that of others. In contrast, “a person of humanity will be in one body with ten thousand things” (2a; 15). This means that a person of humanity, a person who is not numb (lacking ren) is sensitive to the pain of other beings, not only human beings but also non-human beings, in the same way that one is sensitive to one’s own pain.

A difficulty in understanding Cheng Hao’s view of human nature is that he sometimes seems to think that not only good but also evil can be attributed to human nature and principle. About the former, he states that, “while goodness indeed belongs to human nature, it cannot be said that evil does not belong to human nature” (Yishu 1; 10). About the latter, he says that “it is tian li that there are both good and evil in the world” (Yishu 2a; 14) and “that some things are good and some things are evil” (2b; 17). In both cases, however, Cheng Hao does not mean that evil belongs to human nature or principle in the same way as good belongs to human nature, and so what he says in these passages is not inconsistent with his view of human nature as good. As for evil belonging to human nature, Cheng Hao uses the analogy of water. Just as we cannot say muddy water is not water, so we cannot say the distorted human nature is not human nature. Here Cheng Hao makes it clear that water is originally clear, and human nature is originally good. That is why in the same passage in which he says that evil cannot be said not to belong to human nature, he emphasizes that Mencius is right in insisting that human nature is good. So goodness inherently belongs to human nature, while evil is only externally attached to and therefore can be detached from human nature, just as clearness inherently belongs to water, while mud is only externally mixed in and therefore can be eliminated from water (Yishu 1; 10-11). In the two passages in which Cheng Hao states that it is li or tian li that there are both good and evil people, Cheng does not mean that heaven or principle as life-giving activity is both good and evil. In such contexts, Cheng Hao means something different by li and tian li. It does not mean heaven or principle but means something similar to what Descartes sometimes called “natural light.” What he says in these passages is then that it is natural or naturally understandable (tian li) that there are good people and there are bad people. The question then is why it is natural or naturally understandable to have both good people and evil people when human nature is purely good.

4. Origin of Evil

Cheng Hao holds the view that human nature is good and yet thinks it natural that there are both good people and evil people. To explain this, like many other neo-Confucians, Cheng Hao appeals to the distinction between principle and vital force (qi). While the ideas of both principle (li) (to which human nature is identical) and vital force (qi), appeared in earlier Confucian texts, it is in neo-Confucianism that these two become an important pair. In Cheng Hao’s view, “it is not complete to talk about human nature without talking about qi, while it is not illuminating to talk about qi without talking about human nature” (Yishu 6; 81). It is common among neo-Confucians to regard human nature as good and to attribute the origin of evil to the vital force. In this respect Cheng Hao is not an exception. Cheng Hao claims that it is natural that there are good people and evil people precisely because of vital force. Thus, in the same passage in which he uses the analogy of water, after claiming that human nature and vital force cannot be separated from each other, he states that “human life is endowed with vital force, and therefore it is naturally understandable (li) that there are good and evil (people)…. Some people have been good since childhood, and some people have been evil since childhood. This is all because of the vital force they are endowed with” (Yishu 1; 10). Then he uses the analogy of water. Water is the same everywhere, but some water becomes muddy after flowing a short distance, some becomes muddy after flowing a long distance, and some remains clear even when flowing into the sea. The original state of water is clear; whether it remains clear or becomes muddy depends upon the condition of the route it flows. The original state of human nature is good; whether a person remains good or becomes evil depends upon the quality of the vital force the person is endowed with.

There is an apparent problem, however, with this solution to the problem of the origin of evil. Cheng Hao argues that what constitutes human nature is not only present in human beings but also in all ten thousand things. Thus, after explaining the five constant components of human nature – humanity, rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness – Cheng Hao points out that “all ten thousand things have the same nature, and these five are constant natures” (Yishu 9; 105). Cheng Hao repeatedly claims that ten thousand things form one body. In his view, this is “because all ten thousand things have the same principle”; human beings are born with a complete nature, but “we cannot say other things do not have it” (Yishu 2a; 33). Thus Cheng Hao argues that horses and cows also love their children, because the four beginnings that Mencius talks about are also present in them (Yishu 2b; 54). In other words, in terms of nature, there is no difference between human beings and other beings. The difference between human beings and other beings lies in their ability to extend (tui) the principle destined in ten thousand things (to extend the natural love beyond one’s intimate circle), and the difference in this ability further lies in the kind of vital force they are respectively endowed with. Thus Cheng Hao argues that “Humans can extend the principle, while things cannot because their vital force is muddy” (Yishu 2a; 33). Here, he emphasizes that the vital force that animals are endowed with is not clear. In contrast, “the vital force that human beings are endowed with is most clear, and therefore human beings can become partner [with heaven and earth]” (Yishu 2b; 54). In addition to this distinction between clear and muddy vital forces, Cheng Hao also claims that the vital force that humans are endowed with is balanced (zheng), while the vital force that animals are endowed with is one-sided (pian). After reaffirming that human heart-mind is the same as the heart-mind of animals and plants, he says that “the difference between human beings and other beings is whether the vital force they are respectively endowed with is balanced or one-sided [between yin and yang]. Neither yin alone nor yang alone can give birth to anything. When one-sided, yin and yang give birth to birds, beast, and barbarians; when balanced, yin and yang give birth to humans” (Yishu 1; 4; see also Yishu 11; 122).

Cheng Hao thus makes precisely the same distinction between good people and evil people as he makes between human beings and animals. The apparent problem here would seem to be that evil people would then be indistinguishable from animals since they are both endowed with turbid, one-sided, and mixed vital force, as Cheng Hao does often regard evil people as beasts. However, the problem is rather: since Cheng Hao believes that animals cannot be transformed into human beings because their endowed vital force is turbid, one-sided, and mixed, how can he believe, as he does, that evil humans who are also endowed with such turbid, one-sided, and mixed vital force can be transformed into moral beings and even sages? In other words, what is the difference between evil humans and beasts that makes the difference?

Cheng Hao seems to be aware of this problem, and he attempts to solve it by making the distinction between host vital force (zhu qi) and alien or guest vital force (ke qi). For example, he states that “rightness (yi) and the principle (li) on the one side and the alien vital force on the other often fight against each other. The distinction between superior persons and inferior persons is made according to the degree of the one conquered by another. The more the principle and rightness gain the upper hand…the more the alien vital force is extinguished” (Yishu 1; 4-5). For human beings, the host vital force is the one that is constitutive of human beings, which makes human being a bodily existence, while the guest vital force is constitutive of the environment, in which a human being, as a bodily existence, is born and lives. This distinction between host and alien vital force is equivalent to the one between internal (nei qi) and external vital force (wai qi) that his brother Cheng Yi makes, and therefore the analogy the Cheng Yi uses to explain the latter distinction can assist us in understanding the former distinction. For Cheng Yi, the internal vital force is not mixed with but absorbs nourishment from the external vital force. Then he uses the analogy of fish in water to explain it: “The life of fish is not caused by water. However, only by absorbing nourishment from water can fish live. Human beings live between heaven and earth in the same way as fish live in water. The nourishment humans receive from drinking and food is from the external vital force” (Yishu 15; 165-166).

In this analogy, a fish has both its internal or host vital force, the vital force that it is internally endowed with, which accounts for its corporeal form, and its external or guest vital force, the vital force it is externally endowed with, which provides the environment in which fish can live. This analogy performs the same function as Cheng Hao’s own analogy of water (mentioned above). Water itself is a bodily being with a nature and internal vital force, both of which guarantee its clearness. However, water has to exist in external vital force (river, for example). If this external vital force is also favorable, the water will remain clear, but if it is not favorable, the water will become muddy. In this analogy, water is equivalent to human beings, and “the clearness of water is equivalent to the goodness of human nature” (Yishu 1; 11). Through such an analogy, Cheng Hao attempts to show that, in addition to human nature, humans are endowed both internally with the host vital force, which is constitutive of human body, and externally with the alien vital force, which makes up the natural and social environment in which humans live. Therefore, not only is human nature all good, but the host vital force constitutive of human beings is also pure, clear, and balanced. Neither of the two can account for human evil. However, since human beings are corporeal beings, they must be born to and live in the midst of external vital force, which can be pure or impure. It is the quality of this external or guest vital force, purity or impurity, and the way people deal with it, that distinguishes between good and evil people. If the external vital force is also pure, it will provide the necessary nourishment to the internal vital force and therefore the original good human nature will not be damaged, and people will be good. If the external vital force is turbid and human beings living in it have not developed immunity to it, their internal vital force will be malnourished or even polluted and the original good human nature will be damaged, and people will be evil.

Thus, in Cheng Hao’s view, although both evil people and animals are endowed with muddy, mixed, and one-sided vital force, evil people are endowed with it externally as the necessary environment in which they have to live, while animals are endowed with it internally as constitutive of their bodily existence. In other words, such muddy, mixed, and one-sided vital force is the external guest vital force for human beings but is the internal host vital force for animals. Since the host vital force constitutive of animals – the vital force that makes animals animals – is muddy, mixed, and one-sided, animals can never be transformed into moral beings. On the other hand, since the host vital force constitutive of evil people, just as that constitutive of good people, is originally pure, clear, and balanced, but is only later polluted by muddy, mixed, and one-sided alien vital force, they can be made to become good by clearing up the pollution. Here, just as muddy water, when purified, does not enter into a state it has never been in before but simply returns to its original state of clearness, so an evil person, when made good, does not become an entirely new being, but simply returns to its original state of goodness (Yishu 1; 10-11). A return to this original state requires moral cultivation.

5. Moral Cultivation

Cheng Hao’s distinction between the host vital force and guest vital force makes a great contribution to the solution of the problem of the origin of evil. At least this is a step further than simply appealing to the distinction between principle and vital force. Still it is hard to say that it is completely successful, as it seems to attribute the origin of evil entirely to the external environment, which is also suggested by Mencius in his analogies of the growing of wheat (Mencius 6a7) and the Niu Mountain (Mencius 6a8). Some scholars believe such a view is implausible, and even both Cheng Hao and Mencius think that an evil person is also responsible for becoming bad. However, neither of them provides a satisfactory explanation about the internal origin of evil. Perhaps their very idea of the original goodness of human nature prevents such an explanation, just as Xunzi’s idea of the original badness of human nature perhaps prevents him from a satisfactory explanation of the origin of goodness: Xunzi does appeal to the transformative influence of sages and their teaching as a solution to the problem, but then he faces the problem of the origin of sages as their nature, as he claims, is also evil.

Whether Cheng Hao’s solution to the problem of the origin of evil is satisfactory or not, it is undeniable that one can become evil even though his or her nature is good. So Cheng Hao emphasizes the importance of moral cultivation. Since evil occurs when the turbid external vital force pollutes one’s originally clean internal vital force, just as the dust and dirt in the river makes the originally clear water muddy, what is needed is to purify the contaminated internal vital force, just as the turbid water must settle to become clear. This process is called cultivation of the vital force (yang qi) in Mencius. When the internal vital force is cultivated to the utmost, it becomes as clear, bright, pure, and complete as it is in its original state. This is also what Mencius calls “flood-like” vital force (haoran zhi qi), and so Cheng Hao puts a great emphasis on the passage of the Mencius in which Mencius talks about the cultivation of this flood-like vital force (Yishu 11; 117). Cheng Hao claims that “the flood-like vital force is nothing but my own [internally endowed] vital force. When it is cultivated instead of being harmed, it can fill between heaven and earth. Once it is blocked by private desires, however, it will immediately become withered” (Yishu 2a; 20). In other words, Mencius’ flood-like vital force is what everyone is originally internally endowed with, and everyone should cultivate it in case it gets contaminated by the turbid external vital force.

How does one cultivate the flood-like vital force? Cheng Hao claims that it does not come from outside. Rather it results from “consistent moral actions (jiyi)” (Yishu 2a; 29 and Yishu 11; 124). So jiyi becomes the way to cultivate the flood-like vital force. Thus, commenting on the passage in which Mencius talks about the flood-like vital force, Cheng Hao points out that, “cultivated straightly from dao and along the line of principle, it fills up between heaven and earth. [Mencius says that] ‘it is to be accompanied with rightness and dao,’ which means that it takes rightness as its master and never diverts from dao. [Mencius says that] ‘This is generated by consistent moral actions,’ which means that everything one does is in accordance with rightness” (Yishu 1; 11).

To say that cultivation of vital force consists in consistent moral actions, however, for Cheng Hao, does not mean that one has to exert artificial effort to do what is right, even though one does not have the inclination to do it. For this reason, he repeatedly cites Mencius’ claim that “while you must never let it out of your mind, you must not forcibly help it grow either” (Mencius 2a2). In other words, one has to set one’s mind on moral actions and yet cannot force such actions upon oneself. What is important for Cheng Hao is that, when one engages oneself in moral practices, one is not to regulate one’s action with the principle of rightness, as otherwise one will not be able to feel joy in it. In Cheng Hao’s view, this is a distinction best exemplified by the sage king Shun, who “practices from rightness and humanity” instead of “practicing rightness and humanity” (Yishu 3; 61). In other words, one cannot regard morality as external rules that constrain one’s action but as internal source that inclines one to act naturally, without effort, and at ease.

A person becomes evil because of the turbid external force. However, the turbid force can also make one evil because a person’s will is not firm. Thus another way of moral cultivation is to firm up one’s will (chi zhi). While cultivation of the vital force can help firming up one’s original good will, firming up one’s original good will can also help cultivate the vital force. Thus, referring to Mencius’ view about the relationship between these two, Cheng Hao states that, “for a person whose vital force is yet to be cultivated, the activity of the vital force may move one’s will, and the decision of one’s will may cause the movement of the vital force. However, to a person whose virtue is fulfilled, since the will is already firmed up, the vital force will not be able to change one’s will” (Yishu 1; 11). So in Cheng Hao’s view, to avoid being polluted by turbid vital force, it is important to firm up one’s will: “as soon as one’s will is firmed up, the vital force cannot cause any trouble” (Yishu 2b; 53). On the one hand, if one’s will is not firm, it may be disturbed by violent vital force; on the other hand, if one’s will is firm, the vital force cannot disturb it.

In order to firm up one’s will, Cheng Hao claims that it is most important to live in reverence (ju jing). The primary function of being in reverence is to overcome one’s selfish desires: “As soon as one has selfish desires, [one’s heart-mind] will wither, and the flood-like vital force will be lacking” (Yishu 2a; 29). To be reverent inside is to overcome selfish desires. As soon as these selfish desires are overcome, one will be like a sage, who “is happy with things because they are things one ought to be happy with, and is angry at things because they are things one ought to be angry at. The sage’s being happy or angry is thus according to things and not according to his own likes or dislikes” (Wenji 2; 461). This is because, in Cheng Hao’s view, the inborn virtues of sages and worthies are also complete in everyone’s original nature. Thus when not harmed, one need only practice straightly from the inside. If there is some damage, one must be reverent so that it can be purified and return to its original state (Yishu 1; 1).

These two ways of moral cultivation – cultivation of the vital force (yang qi), which relies upon consistent moral actions (jiyi), and firming up one’s will (chi zhi), which relies upon one’s being reverent (ju jin) – are what the Book of Chang calls “being reverent (jing) so that one’s inner [heart-mind] will be upright and being right (yi) so that one’s external [actions] will be in accord [with principle].” The former is internal and the latter is external. In Cheng Hao’s view, they are also the only ways to become a sage. One of the common features of these two methods is that they both aim at one’s virtues so that a virtuous person takes delight in being virtuous without making forced efforts (Yishu 2a; 20). Thus, just as he emphasizes “being reverent so that the inner will be straightened” (jing yi zhi nei) instead of “using reverence to straighten the inner” (yi jing zhi nei), he emphasizes “being morally right so that one’s external action will be squared” (yi yi fang wai) instead of “using rightness to square one’s external action” (yi yi fang wai) (Yishu 11; 120). (Although these two Chinese phrases appear identical in romanization, they contain different characters, as can be seen from their different translations.) Moreover, while the two ways can be respectively called internal way and external way, Cheng Hao emphasizes that it is important “to combine the inner way and the external way” (Yishu 1; 9). In other words, these two ways are not separate, as if one could practice one without practicing the other.

6. Influence

Han Yu (768-824), an important Tang dynasty Confucian, established a lineage of the Confucian tradition (daotong) from Yao, Shun, Yu, Tang, King Wen, King Wu, Duke of Zhou, Confucius, and Mencius. He claimed that, after Mencius, this lineage was interrupted. Cheng Yi accepted this Confucian daotong and claimed that his brother Cheng Hao was the first one to continue this lineage after Mencius (Wenji 11; 640). While there may be some exaggeration in such a claim, particularly as it is in the tomb inscription he wrote for his own brother, there is also truth in it. According to one widely accepted chronology, there are three epochs of Confucianism: pre-Qin Classical Confucianism, neo-Confucianism in the Song and Ming dynasties, and contemporary Confucianism. In the second stage, as far as neo-Confucianism can be characterized as the learning of principle, Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi can indeed be regarded as its true founders, and their learning, through their numerous students, to a large extent determined the later development of neo-Confucianism. While the two brothers share fundamentally similar views and most of these students learned from both, different students noticed and exaggerated their different emphases and thus developed different schools. Among all their students, Xie Liangzuo (1050-1103) and Yang Shi (1053-1135) are the most distinguished. Yang Shi transmitted Cheng Yi’s teaching through his student Luo Congyan (1072-1135) and the latter’s student Li Tong (1093-1163), to Zhu Xi. The synthesizer of the lixue school of neo-Confucianism, Xie Liangzuo transmitted Cheng Hao’s learning through a few generations of students such as Wang Ping (1082-1153) and Zhang Jiucheng (1092-1159) to Lu Jiuyuan (1139-1193) and eventually to Wang Yangming, the culminating figure of the xinxue school of neo-Confucianism. Sometimes a third school of neo-Confucianism, xingxue (learning of human nature), is identified, whose most important representative is Hu Hong (?-1161). Hu Hong continued the learning of his father, Hu Anguo (1074-1138), who in turn was also influenced by Xie Liangzuo. In this sense, Cheng Hao leaves his mark on all three main schools of neo-Confucianism (all recognized, in Chinese scholarship, as lixue, learning of principle, understood in the broad sense).

7. References and Further Reading

  • Bol, Peter. Neo-Confucianism in History. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Asia Center, 2008.
    • There are scattered discussions of Cheng Hao throughout the book.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • Chapter 31 is the most extensive English translation of selected sayings and writings by Cheng Hao.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucianism, vol. 1. New Haven, Conn.: College and University Press, 1957.
    • Chapter 9 is devoted to Cheng Hao.
  • Cheng, Hao & Cheng, Yi. Collected Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng Ji). Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1988.
    • A collection of the works and sayings of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi.
  • Fung, Yu-lan (Feng, Yulan). A History of Chinese Philosophy. Vol. II. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • Chapter XII, Section 2, is a combined study of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi.
  • Graham, A.C. Two Chinese Philosophers. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1992.
    • The only book length study of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi in English.
  • Hon, Tze-ki. “Cheng Hao.” In A. S. Cua, ed., Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy. New York: Routledge, 2003.
    • A full length article on Cheng Hao’s philosophy.
  • Hsu, Fu-kuan. “Chu Hsi and Cheng Brothers.” In Wing-tsit Chan, ed., Chu Hsi and Neo-Confucianism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii, 1986.
    • A study of the similarity and difference between Zhu Xi and the Cheng brothers.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. Essentials of Neo-Confucianism: Eight Major Philosophers of the Song and Ming Periods. Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1999.
    • One chapter is devoted to a philosophical study of Cheng Hao.
  • Huang, Yong. “Confucian Love and Global Ethics: How the Cheng Brothers Would Help Respond to Christian Criticisms.” Asian Philosophy 15/1 (2005): 35-60.
    • A discussion of the contemporary significance of the Cheng brothers’ interpretation of love with distinction.
  • Huang, Yong. “The Cheng Brothers’ Onto-Theological Articulation of Confucian Values.” Asian Philosophy 17/3 (2007): 187-211.
    • An interpretation of the Cheng brothers’ li as life-giving activity.
  • Huang, Yong. “Neo-Confucian Political Philosophy: The Cheng Brothers on Li (Propriety) as Political, Psychological, and Metaphysical.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 34/2 (2007): 217-239.
    • An exposition of the Cheng brothers’ li as rules of action, as one’s inner feeling, and as human nature.
  • Huang, Yong. “Why Be Moral? The Cheng Brothers’ Neo-Confucian Answer.” Journal of Religious Ethics 36/2 (2008): 321-353.
    • A discussion of the Cheng brothers’ conception of human nature as a response to the question of why be moral.
  • Wong, Wai-ying. “The Status of li in the Cheng Brothers’ Philosophy.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 3/1 (2003): 109-119.
    • An important study of the Cheng brothers’ conception of propriety.
  • Wong, Wai-ying. “Morally Bad in the Philosophy of the Cheng Brothers.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 36/1 (2009): 157-176.
    • A good discussion of the Cheng brothers’ view of evil.

Author Information

Yong Huang
Kutztown University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

Feminist Jurisprudence

American feminist jurisprudence is the study of the construction and workings of the law from perspectives which foreground the implications of the law for women and women's lives. This study includes law as a theoretical enterprise as well its practical and concrete effects in women's lives. Further, it includes law as an academic discipline, and thus incorporates concerns regarding pedagogy and the influence of teachers. On all these levels, feminist scholars, lawyers, and activists raise questions about the meaning and the impact of law on women's lives. Feminist jurisprudence seeks to analyze and redress more traditional legal theory and practice. It focuses on the ways in which law has been structured (sometimes unwittingly) that deny the experiences and needs of women. Feminist jurisprudence claims that patriarchy (the system of interconnected relations and institutions that oppress women) infuses the legal system and all its workings, and that this is an unacceptable state of affairs. Consequently, feminist jurisprudence is not politically neutral, but a normative approach, as expressed by philosopher Patricia Smith: "[F]eminist jurisprudence challenges basic legal categories and concepts rather than analyzing them as given. Feminist jurisprudence asks what is implied in traditional categories, distinctions, or concepts and rejects them if they imply the subordination of women. In this sense, feminist jurisprudence is normative and claims that traditional jurisprudence and law are implicitly normative as well" (Smith 1993, p. 10). Feminist jurisprudence sees the workings of law as thoroughly permeated by political and moral judgments about the worth of women and how women should be treated. These judgments are not commensurate with women's understandings of themselves, nor even with traditional liberal conceptions of (moral and legal) equality and fairness.

Although feminist jurisprudence revolves around a number of questions and features a diversity of focus and approach, two characteristics are central to it. First, because the Anglo-American legal tradition is built on liberalism and its tenets, feminist jurisprudence tends to respond to liberalism in some way. The second characteristic is the goal of bringing the law and its practitioners to recognize that law as currently constructed does not acknowledge or respond to the needs of women, and must be changed. These two features can be seen in the major debates in current feminist jurisprudence, which range from questions of the proper perspective from which to understand the problems of the law, to questions of legal theory and practice.

Table of Contents

  1. Responding to Liberalism: Questions of Perspective
  2. Central Concerns: Questions of Theory and Practice
    1. Equality and Rights
    2. Understanding Harm
    3. The Processes of Adjudication
  3. Trajectories
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Responding to Liberalism: Questions of Perspective

As a critical theory, feminist jurisprudence responds to the current dominant understanding of legal thought, which is usually identified with the liberal Anglo-American tradition. (This tradition is represented by such authors as Hart 1961 and Dworkin 1977, 1986.) Two major branches of this tradition have been legal positivism, on the one hand, and natural law theory on the other. Feminist jurisprudence responds to both these branches of the American legal tradition by raising questions regarding their assumptions about the law, including:

  • that law is properly objective and thus must have recourse to objective rules or understandings at some level
  • that law is properly impartial, especially in that it is not to be tainted by the personal experience of any of its practitioners, particularly judges
  • that equality must function as a formal notion rather than a substantive one, such that in the eyes of the law, difference must be shown to be "relevant" in order to be admissible/visible
  • that law, when working properly, should be certain, and that the goal of lawmaking and legal decision-making is to gain certainty
  • that justice can be understood as a matter of procedures, such that a proper following of procedures can be understood as sufficient to rendering justice.

Each of these assumptions, although contested and debated, has remained a significant feature of the liberal tradition of legal understanding.

Feminist jurisprudence usually frames its responses to traditional legal thought in terms of whether or not the critic is maintaining some commitment to the tradition or some particular feature of it. This split in responses has been formulated in a number of different ways, according to the particular concerns they emphasize. The two formulations found most frequently in American feminist jurisprudence characterize the split either as the reformist/radical debate or as the sameness/difference debate. Within the reformist/radical debate, reformist feminists argue that the liberal tradition offers much that can be shaped to fit feminist hands and should be retained for all that it offers. These feminists approach jurisprudence with an eye to what needs to be changed within the system that already exists. Their work, then, is to gain entry into that system and use its own tools to construct a legal system which prevents the inequities of patriarchy from affecting justice.

Those who see the traditional system as either bankrupt or so problematic that it cannot be reshaped are often referred to as transformist or radical feminists. According to this approach, the corruption of the legal tradition by patriarchy is thought to be too deeply embedded to allow for any significant adjustments to the problems that women face. Feminists using this approach tend to argue that the legal system, either parts or as a whole, must be abandoned. They argue that liberal legal concepts, categories and processes must be rejected, and new ones put in place which can be free from the biases of the current system. Their work, then, is to craft the transformations that are necessary in legal theory and practice and to create a new legal system that can provide a more equitable justice.

Under the sameness/difference debate, the central concern for feminists is to understand the role of difference and how women's needs must be figured before the law. Sameness feminists argue that to emphasize the differences between men and women is to weaken women's abilities to gain access to the rights and protections that men have enjoyed. Their concern is that it is women's difference that has been used to keep women from enjoying a legal status equal to men's. Consequently, they see difference as a concept that must be de-emphasized. Sameness feminists work to highlight the ways in which women can be seen as the same as men, entitled to the same rights, protections, and privileges.

Difference feminists argue that (at least some of) the differences between men and women, as well as other types of difference such as race, age, and sexual orientation, are significant. These significant differences must be taken into account by the law in order for justice and equity to be achieved. What has been good law for men cannot simply be adopted by women, because women are not in fact the same as men. Women have different needs which require different legal remedies. The law must be made to recognize differences that are relevant to women's lives, status and possibilities.

The two characterizations of the debate about what perspective is best for understanding the problems of the law do share some features. Those who argue a sameness position are often thought to fit, to some degree, with the reformist view. Difference feminists are seen as sharing much with radicals. The parallel between the two characterizations is that both argue over how much, if any, of the current legal system can and must be preserved and put to use in the service of feminist concerns. The two characterizations are not the same, but the important parallel between them allows for some generalization regarding the ways in which each is likely to respond to particular theoretical and substantive issues. However, while the two may reasonably be grouped for some purposes, they must not be conflated.

From these perspectives, feminist jurisprudence emphasizes two kinds of question: the theoretical and the substantive. These two kinds of question are, perhaps especially for feminists, deeply connected and overlapping. Discussions of central theoretical issues in feminist jurisprudence are punctuated by elaboration of the substantive issues with which they are intertwined.

2. Central Concerns: Questions of Theory and Practice

In asking theoretical questions, feminists are concerned with how to understand the law itself, its proper scope, legitimacy, and meaning. Many of these are the questions of traditional legal theory, but asked in the context of the feminist project: What is the proper moral foundation of the law, especially given that any answer depends on the moral principles of the dominant structure of the society? What is the meaning of rule of law, especially given that obedience to law has been an important part of the history of subjugation? What is the meaning of equality, especially in a world of diversity? What is the meaning of harm, especially in a world in which women, not men, are subjected by men to certain kinds of violence? How can adjudication of conflict be properly and fairly achieved, especially when not all persons are able to come to the adjudication process on a "level playing field"? What is the meaning of property, and how can women avoid being categorized as property? Is law the best and most appropriate channel for the resolution of conflict, especially given its traditional grounding in patriarchal goals and structures?

Although feminists have addressed all these questions and more, perhaps one issue stands out in many feminists' eyes as a matter of special importance, encompassing as it does some aspect of many of the questions noted above. The issue that for many feminists is at the heart of concerns is that of equality and rights. Two others that may be considered nearly as central are problems of harm, and of the processes of adjudication.

a. Equality and Rights

Law works partly by drawing abstract guiding principles out of the specifics of the cases it adjudicates. On this abstract level, theoretical questions arise for feminist jurisprudence regarding equality and rights, including the following: what understanding of equality will make it possible for women to have control over their lives, in both the private and public spheres? What understanding of equality will provide an adequate grounding for the concept of rights, such that women's rights can protect both their individual liberty and their identity as women?

In general, the feminist concern with equality involves the claim that equality must be understood not simply as a formal concept that functions rhetorically and legally. Equality must be a substantive concept which can actually make changes in the power structure and the relative power positions of men and women generally. Although equality is examined in a wide variety of specific applications, the major concern is the goal of making equality meaningful in the lives of women. But for many feminists, concerns with equality cannot be addressed without also attending to rights. Because the liberal tradition figures rights as the hallmark of equality, it is in terms of rights that we are expected to see ourselves as equals before the law. Further, rights discourse has structured both our understanding of equality, and our claims to it.

Examinations of equality are, therefore, often framed by particular substantive issues. For example, much feminist jurisprudence regarding equality is framed in terms of concerns about work. If women are equal, then how will this be expressed in workplace law and policy? One of the key issues in this field has been how to treat pregnancy in the workplace: Is it fair for women to have extended or paid leave for pregnancy and birthing? Under what circumstances, or limitations? Are women being given "special" rights if they have a right to such leave? The struggle over the proper understanding of pregnancy and work raises questions about whether women should be treated in such law as individuals or as a class. As individuals, it has seemed relatively easy for workplaces to claim that not all employees are given such leave, and thus that women who do not are being treated "equally". One feminist strategy has been to attempt to revise such law to recognize the particular difference of women as a class. Herma Hill Kay, for example, argues that pregnancy can be seen as an episode which affects women's ability to take advantage of opportunities in the workplace, and that pregnant workers must be protected against loss of equal opportunity during episodes of pregnancy. (Kay, 1985)

Concerns over pregnancy express the fundamental questions of the sameness/difference debate. The sameness position suggests difference should be erased to the greatest extent possible, because it has been used as a basis for discrimination. Difference proponents argue that pregnancy involves significant differences which should be seen as a linchpin of legal understanding. Does equality mean that women should wish to be treated exactly the same as men, or does it mean that women should wish to be treated differently, because their differences are such that same treatment cannot provide equity?

Feminists who argue that equality requires creating for women the same opportunities and rights which are currently available to men of the ruling class are bringing the reformist or sameness approach to bear. Approaches to rights and equality which focus on women's individuality, emphasizing it in the way that law has done for men and requiring women to show that they are like men and thus may be treated like men, tend then to be reformist or sameness oriented. Because these approaches are seen as requiring that women become as much like men as possible, and that law treat women as it does men, they are often referred to as assimilationist.

Christine Littleton (Littleton, 1987) offers a further set of terms for approaches to understanding equality: symmetrical (paralleling reformist and sameness approaches) and asymmetrical (paralleling radical and difference approaches). This classification refers to how women and men are "located in society" with regard to issues, norms and rules. If a theorist sees men and women as sharing a location regarding an issue, then that theorist has a symmetrical approach; if not, then the approach is asymmetrical. Littleton classifies assimilationist approaches as symmetrical, along with what she calls the androgyny approach. The androgyny approach argues that men and women are very much alike, but that equality will require social institutions to pick a "mean" between the two, and apply that standard to all persons. This model is less frequently argued than the assimilation model.

There are also many radical and difference approaches to equality. What they share is the desire to avoid having to take on all that is questionable and/or undesirable about (society's construction of) men in order to be considered equal before the law. Thus many radical approaches (although not all - MacKinnon, below, is an example of one which is not) emphasize similar questions and problems as difference approaches. How to recognize relevant difference, and what kind of difference law must be responsive to, is a crucial part of these feminist examinations of equality. Ann Scales, for example, argues that liberal/reformist approaches do not do enough to really make the changes that are necessary, because the problem in equality is a problem of understanding how domination works. We must learn to see how equality has formally been tied in to domination through the liberal framework. In her view, a certain kind of inequality needs to be recognized and worked with, rather than ignored or assimilated. (Scales, 1986)

Other difference/radical approaches include the special rights, accommodation, acceptance, and empowerment models. (Littleton, 1987) The special rights model suggests that justice requires our recognizing that equality is too easily understood as "sameness", where men and women are not the same. Rights should be based on needs, and if women have needs that men do not, that should not limit their rights. The accommodation model asserts that differences which are not fundamental or biologically based should be treated under a symmetrical or assimilation model. But this leaves those differences which are fundamental (such as the ability to be pregnant) as differences which must be recognized in the law and accommodated by it.

Littleton's own approach is expressed in the acceptance model. This argues that (gender) difference must be accepted, and that law should focus on the consequences of such differences, rather than the differences themselves. Although differences exist between men and women, equality should function to make these differences "costless" relative to each other. Equality should function to prevent women's being penalized on the basis of their difference. Thus equality should require us to institute paid leave for pregnancy and birthing, and to guarantee women's return to their jobs after birthing.

Empowerment models reject difference as irrelevant, and shift focus to levels of empowerment. Equality, then, is understood as what balances power for groups and individuals, and dismantles the ability of some to dominate others. This radical and asymmetrical view does not, however, fit well with the categorization of feminist positions in terms of sameness and difference. The empowerment model's focus on domination and the ways in which power is distributed seems to represent a significant departure from the parallel suggested above. Thus some feminist jurists have suggested that it be understood as a separate approach. Judith Baer calls it simply the domination model of feminist jurisprudence. Catherine MacKinnon is one well-known scholar who holds this view. (MacKinnon, 1987) In her theorizing of pornography, for example, she focuses on the question of how power is used in pornography to maintain a structure of domination which belies the possibility of equality between men and women.

Feminist critiques of rights in general assert that rights have been apportioned based on notions of equality that deliberately exclude the needs of women. If rights are to be truly equal, they must be apportioned on a more equitable basis, informed by the experience of women and others previously excluded. Or, following MacKinnon or Patricia Williams (discussed below), rights must be apportioned based on how they empower those to whom they are granted. Feminist scholars debate the ground for understanding rights while working to create a foundation from which women can claim and exercise rights that will be meaningful in their lives.

b. Understanding Harm

Perhaps the most difficult question for feminist jurisprudence regarding the issue of harm is that of perspective: who defines and identifies harm in specific cases? Given that law has traditionally worked from a patriarchal perspective, it is perhaps not surprising that identifying harm to women has been problematic. A patriarchal system will benefit from a very stingy recognition of harms against women. Feminist jurisprudence, therefore, must examine the basic question, what is harm? It also must ask, what counts as harm in our legal system, and why? What has been excluded from definitions of harm that women need included, and how can such trends be overturned?

Three types of harm-causing actions that are typically and systematically directed against women have formed the background for discussion about what harm means, and what counts as harm: rape, sexual harassment, and battering. Until fairly recently (for example, before the legislative reform movements of the 1970s), some forms of these actions were not considered actionable offenses under the law. This was largely due to the history of understanding women not as independent and autonomous agents, but as property belonging to men (thus issues of the meaning of property are also crucial to understanding harm). Feminist jurisprudence has challenged this state of affairs. As a result, changes have been made in the laws regarding each of the three categories, although the effectiveness of these changes is widely disputed (see, e.g., Schulhofer 1998 for an excellent review of this law). At the very least, work by feminists has made it possible to speak of these harms by providing a vocabulary for them, by raising awareness about them, and by prosecuting them more frequently and with some success.

Discussions of rape attempt to answer many of the questions that apply to all three types of harm-causing actions. Cases of all three types give rise to similar problems that prevent women from being treated justly: blaming the victim; privileging the point of view of "the" agent, i.e., the male perpetrator; indicting the woman's sexual history while ignoring the man's history, whether sexual or violent. Underlying all these problems are assumptions about gender and agency which encourage the law to place responsibility for their own harm on women rather than on the men who cause it. Women have been believed to be mentally unstable or at least weak-minded, to be scheming and deceptive, and to have an improper motivation for making claims of harm against men. For these reasons, they tend to be seen as untrustworthy witnesses. Because they have been characterized as sexually insatiable and indiscriminate, they tend to be seen as deserving whatever harm they "provoke" from men. Corresponding assumptions about men's rational superiority encourage their being seen as believable witnesses. At the same time, assumptions about men's natural sexual needs are taken as justification for their violations of women. Feminist jurisprudence attempts to respond to these problems as double standards and matters of equality and rights.

Other issues of harm require different responses. Harm-causing actions tend to be defined in terms of external and observable characteristics (levels of force), of intention on the part of the agent (mens rea), and of the consent of the one harmed. Consequently, what is at issue is how law uses these criteria in determining both when harm has occurred and whether it is to be justified or excused. What feminist jurisprudence has found is that women and men frequently differ over the understanding of each of these criteria. But since it is a patriarchal understanding which grounds the law, women's understandings tend not to be given a proper hearing.

In Susan Estrich's discussion of rape (Estrich, 1987, 1987a), she claims that the mens rea criterion can be used to create either too much emphasis on the perpetrator's intention, or too little. In either case, she believes the focus on this criterion makes evident the law's lack of understanding of and concern for the harms women suffer. The law's focus is to not wrongly punish men, which is achieved at the cost of not protecting women.

Further, Estrich argues that the force criterion is understood from a patriarchal perspective: force is seen as a matter of what "boys do in schoolyards." This criterion figures force as a simple matter of the straightforward use of physical strength, or the use of implements of violence. But it ignores the kinds of force that are most frequently used in rape and other types of harm to women, such as psychological coercion. If the courts expect women to resist physical and psychological coercion in the same ways and at the same level that men do, then the courts impose an unreasonable expectation on the "reasonable" woman.

Regarding consent, Estrich explains that the courts have believed that if consent is given, then rape (or other harms) do not occur. This places responsibility on the one who has been harmed to show that she did not, in fact, consent. But patriarchal courts have held that only the strongest and most emphatic expression of non-consent functions as evidence. This means that in many cases, women have been said to have "consented" even though they were physically carried off by men and verbally expressed non-consent (Schulhofer 1998). Non-consent has not been easily proven unless the woman has been severely beaten, or unless a significant weapon (that is, gun or knife) was used, or death was threatened in a way that convinces the court. Thus what non-consent means for the court has been very different from what women themselves have said about (their) consent.

Robin West (West, 1988) argues along similar lines, claiming that women's social training does not impart the same fundamental values that men's training does. She theorizes that men value separation and autonomy to the point that they would physically fight, desperately, to maintain theirs. But because women value connection and relation most highly, they find it difficult to respond to physical violence with violence of their own. Violence destroys connection and relationship, which is what women are socialized to value most. This makes it difficult for women to respond to rape, and other harms, in a way which convinces masculine courts that they did not consent. Women's definition and identification of these harms is very different from what the courts have so far constructed.

It is difficult to separate out some parts of the reformist or sameness and radical or difference approaches with regard to harm. In general, however, those who argue that current laws can be changed to adequately protect women have reformist or sameness views. Those arguing that the current definitions of harm simply cannot be revised sufficiently have radical or difference views. Thus Estrich, who concludes that we need to treat rape as we treat other kinds of crime which require nonconsent (theft, for example) could be considered a reformist view. Mary Lou Fellows and Bev Balos offer a similar analysis of how women's perception of the harms of date rape can be accommodated in current law. This can be accomplished by the application of the heightened duty of care that exists already in the common law doctrine of confidential relationship. (Fellows and Balos, 1991) West's argument, based on recognizing and responding to fundamental differences between men and women regarding harm, could be seen as a radical or difference view. MacKinnon's analysis of sexual harassment, which focuses on the need for women to be empowered to define the harms against them, represents a dominance view on harms.

c. The Processes of Adjudication

Many feminist jurists challenge the processes of adjudication by raising questions about the neutrality or impartiality that such processes are assumed to embody. Neutrality is believed to function in the law in at least two ways. It is assumed to be built into the processes of the law, and it is assumed to be produced by those processes. Feminist jurisprudence challenges the first set of assumptions by raising questions about legal reasoning. It challenges the second by raising questions about how a law created and applied by partial and biased persons can itself be neutral. Thus feminist jurisprudence also raises the question of whether neutrality is a possible, or an appropriate, goal of the law.

As traditionally understood, neutrality in law is supposed to protect us from a number of ills. It protects from personal bias by insisting that judges, attorneys, law enforcement officers, etc., treat us not as people with specific characteristics, but as interchangeable subjects. We should be seen only in terms of certain specific actions and our intentions with regard to those specific actions. Officials are expected not to bring their personal biases to bear on those who come before them, and certain personal aspects of those brought before the law are not permitted to come under scrutiny. For example, if a judge personally believes that women are pathological liars, this is not supposed to influence his or her interpretation of any particular woman's testimony. Similarly, no person's race is supposed to influence any judge's understanding of their case. Feminist jurisprudence challenges such claims to neutrality.

Neutrality in law is supposed to protect against ideological bias as well. It does this by taking a supposedly universal perspective on a case, rather than a particular perspective. This belief that law and its practitioners can see, and judge, from the "view from nowhere" has been criticized by feminist jurisprudence. Feminists claim that such complete objectivity seems not to be fully possible. They also argue that claiming such neutrality deflects attention away from the fact that a partial view - a masculinist view - is being presented as universal. Feminist jurisprudence, like most feminist theory, rejects the claim of law that it is a neutral practice, and instead points to the ways in which law is clearly not neutral.

One of the ways law is not neutral is through the individual people that work in law. Feminist jurisprudence argues that because there is no such thing as the "view from nowhere", every understanding has a perspective. This perspective influences it, and provides an interpretive field for whatever matters of fact there may be. Since law is made, administered and enforced by people, and people must have a perspective, law must reflect those perspectives at least to some degree. Feminists tend to agree that to the extent that a practice or person is unaware of their own perspective, that perspective will more strongly influence their interpretations of the world. It is when we become aware of biases that we are able, through critical reflection, to reduce their influence and thus move toward a greater (although not a perfect) objectivity.

Another way that law is not neutral is in its content. Because it is made by people, many of whom have not critically examined their own standpoints, the content of law may be unfair or discriminatory. Such content would require officials to act in ways that are not impartial, or not fair. But even if law is written by those whose perspectives are relatively objective, our legislative system often imposes compromises on laws. Some compromises required to pass law may change or weaken its objectives in ways that prevent its functioning as intended. These criticisms show that the content of the law, affected by the contestations of our legislative system, may not be neutral. Further, it shows that the processes of the law do not guarantee the neutrality that they are assumed to do.

Neutrality is also assumed to be built into certain processes of the law, and in particular the processes of judicial reasoning. The traditional model of judicial decision-making relies on case law, which uses precedent and analogy to provide evidence and justification. Interpretation of statutes in prior cases provides precedent or rules. Courts then attempt to determine how the facts of current cases require one rule or another to be brought to bear. This way of making decisions has itself been thought to be neutral, and the formalities of due process that support it are thought to reinforce that neutrality. This feature of law, relying on past judgments to influence current and future ones, also makes it peculiarly resistant to change. For feminist jurisprudence, use of precedent allows the law to insulate itself against the critiques of outsiders, including women.

Use of precedent has been challenged by a feminist and non-feminist critiques, including the pragmatism of Margaret Radin (Radin, 1990) and Jerome Frank's legal realism (Frank, 1963). Feminist jurisprudence responds to use of precedent by pointing out those areas which are most likely to be subject to sexist understandings. For example, case law that has derived from cases in which plaintiffs and defendants are men will assume that the circumstances for those men are simply the "normal" circumstances. Workplace law has frequently been challenged by feminist critics for this reason. The law assumes, based on cases in which the workplace was populated mainly by men, that everyone who works shares men's circumstances. This assumption entails that workers are supported by a full-time homemaker, such that the burdens of home life and child rearing should not affect one's ability to function efficiently in the workplace. But such assumptions work against women, who usually are supporting someone else in this way rather than being supported.

Reform and sameness feminists argue that case law is not a bad system but that reforms are needed to emphasize to the realities of women's lives. Radical and difference feminists are more likely to argue that case law is itself a system that is too heavily entrenched in patriarchy to be maintained. Its reliance on precedent makes it too conservative a system of decision-making to be adequately brought to the service of feminism.

3. Trajectories

Although it seems that the sameness/difference and the reform/radical debates could create an impasse for feminists, some theorists believe that some combination of the two views can be more effective than either alone. Patricia Williams (Williams, 1991), for example, believes that rights can function as powerful liberatory tools for the traditionally disadvantaged. However, she also believes that in a racist society such as contemporary America, racial difference must be recognized because it creates disadvantage before the law. In this way, she claims that some features of the liberal tradition, like rights, need to be maintained for the liberatory work they can do. However, she argues that the liberal tradition of formal equality is damaging to historically marginalized groups. This aspect of law needs to be completely transformed.

As an example of the ways in which rights are still needed by the traditionally disadvantaged, she examines the relationship to rights that is enjoyed by a white male colleague. His sense of his rights is so entrenched that he sees them as creating distance between himself and others, and believes that rights should be played down. In contrast, Williams expresses her own relationship to rights, being a black woman, as much more tenuous. The history of American slavery, under which black Americans were literally owned by whites, makes it difficult for both blacks and whites to figure blacks as empowered by rights in the same ways that whites are.

This example shows how Williams weaves together important elements of both reform and radical positions, and at the same time includes the element of empowerment that is seen in dominance positions. She claims that for blacks, and for any traditionally disadvantaged group, rights are a significant part of a program of advancement. One's relationship to rights depends on who one is, and how one is empowered by one's society and law. For those whose rights are already guaranteed, what may be necessary for social change is to challenge the power of rights rhetoric for one's group. But for those whose rights have never been secure, this will not look like the best course of action. Williams' suggestion is that we recognize that rights and rights rhetoric function differently in different settings and for different people. But this, then, is a response which relies on the radical and difference premise that difference must in fact be attended to rather than elided. In order that rights be made effective for historically marginalized people, we must first see that they do not in fact function for all people in the way that they do for those they were created for.

Another approach to drawing the two sides of the debate in feminist jurisprudence together is offered by Judith Baer, whose claim is that feminist jurisprudence to date has failed to either reform or transform law because feminists in both camps have made crucial mistakes. (Baer, 1999) The primary error has been that feminist jurisprudence has tended to misunderstand the tradition it criticizes. Although feminist jurists recognize that the liberal tradition has secured rights for men but not women, they have failed to make explicit the corresponding asymmetry of responsibility. Women are accorded responsibility for themselves and others in ways that men are not. For example, women are expected to be responsible for the lives of children in ways that men are not; as noted above, this has implications in areas like workplace law.

The second major error Baer sees in feminist jurisprudence is that it, along with most feminism, has tended to focus almost exclusively on women. This has drawn feminist attention away from men and the institutions that feminism needs to study, criticize, challenge and change. It has also created a series of debates within feminism that are divisive and draining of feminist energy. Again, the solution is to recognize when reform (sameness) and radical (difference) approaches are effective, and to use each as appropriate. Baer argues that

[f]eminist jurists need not - indeed, we must not – choose between laws that treat men and women the same and laws that treat them differently. We already know that both kinds of law can be sexist. Our gender-neutral law of reproductive rights treats women worse than men, but so did "protective" labor legislation. Conversely, both gender-neutral and gender-specific laws can promote sexual equality. Comparable worth legislation would make women more nearly equal with men. So have affirmative action policies. Women can have it both ways. Law can treat men and women alike where they are alike and differently where they are different. (Baer 1999, 55)

Baer provides critiques of both reform and radical feminist jurisprudence. She concludes that neither alone is sufficient, but that both, applied where appropriate, could be. She argues that the feminist focus on women has encouraged an inability to think on a universal scale. This leaves feminists, and law under feminist jurisprudence, mired in the particularities of individual cases and individual traits. To move out of this mire, she suggests three tasks for feminist jurisprudence:

First, it must do the opposite of what conventional theory and feminist critiques have done: posit rights and question responsibility. Second, it must develop analyses that will separate situations from the people experiencing them, so we can talk about women's victimization without labeling them as victims. Finally, it must move beyond women and begin scrutinizing men and institutions. (Baer 1999, 68)

Baer does not suggest that feminism, nor feminist jurisprudence, should give up the study of women and women's situations. Rather, her suggestion is that this study as an exclusive focus is not sufficient for either reform or transformation. Because "women neither create nor sustain their position in society" feminists need to scrutinize those who do. Baer's suggestion is that what is needed is an account of "what it means to be a human being, a man, or a woman, which makes equality possible." (Baer 1999, 192) The mistakes that feminist jurisprudence has made have prevented its developing this account, which Baer thinks could be the foundation of what she calls a feminist postliberalism sufficient for feminist jurisprudence.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Baer, Judith A, Our Lives Before the Law: Constructing a Feminist Jurisprudence (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1999)
  • Cornell, Drucilla, Beyond Accommodation: Ethical Feminism, Deconstruction and the Law (New York: Routledge, 1990)
  • Dworkin, Andrea, Intercourse, (New York: The Free Press, 1987)
  • Dworkin, Ronald, Law's Empire (Cambridge: Harvaard University Press, 1986)
  • Dworkin, Ronald, Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • Estrich, Susan, "Rape," 95 Yale Law Journal 1087-1184 (1987)
  • Estrich, Susan, Real Rape (Cambrdige: Harvard University Press, 1987a)
  • Fellows, Mary Louise and Beverly Balos, "Guilty of the Crime of Trust: Nonstranger Rape" 75 Minnesota Law Review 599 (1991)
  • Hart, H.L.A., The Concept of Law, (New York, Oxford University Press, 1961)
  • Jerome, Frank, Law and the Modern Mind (New York: Doubleday and Co., 1963)
  • Kay, Herma Hill, "Equality and Difference: The Case of Pregnancy," 1 Berkeley Women's Law Journal 1-37 (1985)
  • Littleton, Christine A., "Reconstructing Sexual Equality," 75 California Law Review 1279-1337 (1987)
  • MacKinnon, Catherine, Feminism Unmodified: Discourses on Life and Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987)
  • Minow, Martha, Making All the Difference: Inclusion, Exclusion and American Law (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991)
  • Radin, Margaret Jane, "The Pragmatist and the Feminist," 63 Southern California Law Review, 1699 (1990)
  • Scales, Ann C., "The Emergence of Feminist Jurisprudence: An Essay," 95 Yale Law Journal 1373-1403 (1986)
  • Schulhofer, Stephen J., Unwanted Sex: The Culture of Intimidation and the Failure of Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998)
  • Smith, Patricia, ed., Feminist Jurisprudence (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993)
  • Tong, Rosemarie, Women, Sex and the Law (Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Littlefield, 1984)
  • West, Robin, "Jurisprudence and Gender," 55 University of Chicago Law Review 1 (1988)
  • Williams, Patricia, The Alchemy of Race and Rights (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1991)

Author Information

Melissa Burchard
University of North Carolina – Asheville
U. S. A.

Buddha (c. 480 B.C.E.—c. 400 B.C.E.)

buddhaThe historical Buddha, also known as Gotama Buddha, Siddhārtha Gautama, and Buddha Śākyamuni, was born in Lumbini, in the Nepalese region of Terai, near the Indian border. He is one of the most important Asian thinkers and spiritual masters of all time, and he contributed to many areas of philosophy, including epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. The Buddha’s teaching formed the foundation for Buddhist philosophy, initially developed in South Asia, then later in the rest of Asia. Buddhism and Buddhist philosophy now have a global following.

In epistemology, the Buddha seeks a middle way between the extremes of dogmatism and skepticism, emphasizing personal experience, a pragmatic attitude, and the use of critical thinking toward all types of knowledge. In ethics, the Buddha proposes a threefold understanding of action: mental, verbal, and bodily. In metaphysics, the Buddha argues that there are no self-caused entities, and that everything dependently arises from or upon something else. This allows the Buddha to provide a criticism of souls and personal identity; that criticism forms the foundation for his views about the reality of rebirth and an ultimate liberated state called “Nirvana.” Nirvana is not primarily an absolute reality beyond or behind the universe but rather a special state of mind in which all the causes and conditions responsible for rebirth and suffering have been eliminated. In philosophical anthropology, the Buddha explains human identity without a permanent and substantial self. The doctrine of non-self, however, does not imply the absolute inexistence of any type of self whatsoever, but is compatible with a conventional self composed of five psycho-physical aggregates, although all of them are unsubstantial and impermanent. Selves are thus conceived as evolving processes causally constrained by their past.

Table of Contents

  1. Interpreting the Historical Buddha
    1. Dates
    2. Sources
    3. Life
    4. Significance
  2. The Buddha’s Epistemology
    1. The Extremes of Dogmatism and Skepticism
    2. The Role of Personal Experience and the Buddha’s Wager
    3. Interpretations of the Buddha’s Advice to the Kālāma People
    4. Higher Knowledge and the Question of Empiricism
  3. The Buddha’s Cosmology and Metaphysics
    1. The Universe and the Role of Gods
    2. The Four Noble Truths or Realities
    3. Ontology of Suffering: the Five Aggregates
    4. Arguments for the Doctrine of Non-self
    5. Human Identity and the Meaning of Non-self
    6. Causality and the Principle of Dependent Arising
  4. Nirvana and the Silence of the Buddha
    1. Two Kinds of Nirvana and the Undetermined Questions
    2. Eternalism, Nihilism, and the Middle Way
  5. Buddhist Ethics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Interpreting the Historical Buddha

a. Dates

There is no complete agreement among scholars and Buddhist traditions regarding the dates of the historical Buddha. The most common dates among Buddhists are those of the Theravāda school, 623-543 B.C.E. From the middle of the 19th century until recently, Western scholars had believed the dates of the Buddha to be ca. 560-480 B.C.E. However, after the publication in 1991-2 of the proceedings of the international symposium on the date of the historical Buddha held in Göttingen in 1988, the original consensus on these dates no longer exists.

Although there is no conclusive evidence for any specific date, most current scholars locate the Buddha’s life one hundred years earlier, around the fifth century B.C.E. Some of the new dates for the Buddha’s "death" or more accurately, for his parinirvāṇa are: ca. 404 B.C.E. (R. Gombrich), between 410-390 B.C.E. (K.R. Norman), ca. 400 B.C.E. (R. Hikata), ca. 397 B.C.E. (K.T.S. Sarao), between ca.400-350 B.C.E. (H. Bechert), 383 B.C.E. (H. Nakamura), 368 B.C.E. (A. Hirakawa), between 420-380 B.C.E. (A. Bareau).

b. Sources

The historical Buddha did not write down any of his teachings, they were passed down orally from generation to generation for at least three centuries. Some scholars have attempted to distinguish the Buddha’s original teachings from those developed by his early disciples. Unfortunately, the contradictory conclusions have led most scholars to be skeptical about the possibility of knowing what the Buddha really taught. This however, does not mean that all Buddhist texts that attribute teachings to the Buddha are equally valuable to reconstruct his thought. The early sūtras in Pāli and other Middle Indo-Aryan languages are historically and linguistically closer to the cultural context of the Buddha than Mahāyāna sūtras in Sanskrit, Tibetan, and Chinese. This does not imply that later translations of the early sūtras in Chinese (there are no Tibetan translations of the early sūtras) are less authentic or useless in reconstructing the philosophy of the Buddha. On the contrary, the comparative study of Pāli and Chinese versions of the early sūtras can help to infer what might have been the Buddha’s position on a number of issues.

Following what seems to be a growing scholarly tendency, I will reconstruct the philosophy of the historical Buddha by drawing on the Sutta Piṭaka of the Pāli canon. More specifically, our main sources are the first four Pāli Nikāyas (Dīgha, Majjhima, Saṃyutta, Aṅguttara) and some texts of the fifth Pāli Nikāya (Dhammapada, Udāna, Itivuttaka, and Sutta Nipāta). I do not identify these sources with the Buddha’s “ipsissima verba,” that is, with “the very words” of the Buddha, even less with his “actual” thought. Whether these sources are faithful to the actual thought and teachings of the historical Buddha is an unanswerable question; I can only say that to my knowledge there are not better sources to reconstruct the philosophy of the Buddha.

According to the traditional Buddhist account, shortly after the Buddha’s death five hundred disciples gathered to compile his teachings. The Buddha’s personal assistant, Ānanda, recited the first part of the Buddhist canon, the Sūtra Piṭaka, which contains discourses in dialogue form between the Buddha, his disciples, and his contemporaries on a variety of doctrinal and spiritual questions. Ānanda is reported to have recited the sutras just as he had heard them from the Buddha; that is why Buddhist sutras begin with the words “Thus have I heard.” Another disciple, Upāli, recited the second part of the Buddhist canon, the Vinaya Piṭaka, which also contains sutras, but primarily addresses the rules that govern a monastic community. After the recitation of Ānanda and Upāli, the other disciples approved what they had heard and communally recited the teachings as a sign of agreement. The third part of the Buddhist canon or Abhidharma Piṭaka, was not recited at that moment. The Theravāda tradition claims that the Buddha taught the Abhidharma while visiting the heaven where his mother was residing.

From a scholarly perspective, the former account is questionable. It might be the case that a large collection of Buddhist texts was written down for the first time in Sri Lanka during the first century B.C.E. However, the extant Pāli canon shows clear signs of historical development in terms of both content and language. The three parts of the Pāli canon are not as contemporary as the traditional Buddhist account seems to suggest: the Sūtra Piṭaka is older than the Vinaya Piṭaka, and the Abhidharma Piṭaka represents scholastic developments originated at least two centuries after the other two parts of the canon. The Vinaya Piṭaka appears to have grown gradually as a commentary and justification of the monastic code (Prātimokṣa), which presupposes a transition from a community of wandering mendicants (the Sūtra Piṭaka period ) to a more sedentary monastic community (the Vinaya Piṭaka period). Even within the Sūtra Piṭaka it is possible to detect older and later texts.

Neither the Sūtra Piṭaka nor the Vinaya Piṭaka of the Pāli canon could have been recited at once by one person and repeated by the entire Buddhist community. Nevertheless, the Sūtra Piṭaka of the Pāli canon is of particular importance in reconstructing the philosophy of Buddha for four main reasons. First, it contains the oldest texts of the only complete canon of early Indian Buddhism, which belong to the only surviving school of that period, namely, the Theravāda school, prevalent in Sri Lanka and Southeast Asia. Second, it has been preserved in a Middle Indo-Aryan language closely related to various Prakrit dialects spoken in North of India during the third century B.C.E., including the area where the Buddha spent most of his teaching years (Magadha). Third, it expresses a fairly consistent set of doctrines and practices. Fourth, it is strikingly similar to another version of the early Sūtra Piṭaka extant in Chinese (Āgamas). This similarity seems to indicate that a great part of the Sūtra Piṭaka in Pāli does not contain exclusively Theravāda texts, and belongs to a common textual tradition probably prior to the existence of Buddhist schools.

c. Life

Since the Pāli Nikāyas contain much more information about the teachings of the Buddha than about his life, it seems safe to postulate that the early disciples of the Buddha were more interested in preserving his teachings than in transmitting all the details of his life. The first complete biographies of the Buddha as well as the Jātaka stories about his former lives appeared centuries later, even after, and arguably as a reaction against, the dry lists and categorizations of early Abhidharma literature. The first complete biography of the Buddha in Pāli is the Nidānakathā, which serves as an introduction to the Jātaka verses found in the fifth Pāli Nikāya. In Sanskrit, the most popular biographies of the Buddha are the Buddhacarita attributed to the Indian poet Aśvaghoṣa (second century C.E), the Mahāvastu, and the Lalitavistara, both composed in the first century C.E.

The first four Pāli Nikāyas contain only fragmented information about the Buddha’s life. Especially important are the Mahāpadāna-suttanta, the Ariyapariyesanā-suttanta, the Mahāsaccaka-suttanta, and the Mahāparinibbāna-suttanta. According to the Mahāpadāna-suttanta, the lives of all Buddhas or perfectly enlightened beings follow a similar pattern. Like all Buddhas of the past, the Buddha of this cosmic era, also known as Gautama (Gotama in Pāli), was born into a noble family. The Buddha’s parents were King Śuddhodana and Queen Māyā. He was a member of the Śakya clan and his name was Siddhartha Gautama. Even though he was born in Lumbinī while his mother was traveling to her parents’ home, he spent the first twenty-nine years of his life in the royal capital, Kapilavastu, in the Nepalese region of Terai, close to the Indian border.

Like all past Buddhas, the conception and birth of Gautama Buddha are considered miraculous events. For instance, when all Buddhas descend into their mothers’ wombs from a heaven named Tuṣita, a splendid light shines forth and the entire universe quakes; their mothers are immaculate, healthy, and without pain of any sort during their ten months of pregnancy, but they die a week after giving birth. Buddha babies are born clean, though they are ritually bathed with two streams of water that fall from the sky; they all take seven steps toward the north and solemnly announce that this is their last rebirth.

Like former Buddhas, prince Siddhartha enjoyed all types of luxuries and sensual pleasures during his youth. Unsatisfied with this type of life, he had a crisis when he realized that everything was ephemeral and that his existence was subject to old age, sickness, and death. After seeing the serene joy of a monk and out of compassion for all living beings, he renounced his promising future as prince in order to start a long quest for a higher purpose, nirvāṇa (Pali nibbāna), which entails the cessation of old age, sickness and death. Later traditions speak of the Buddha as abandoning his wife Yaśodharā immediately after she gave birth to Rāhula, the Buddha’s only son. The Pāli Nikāyas, however, do not mention this story, and refer to Rāhula only as a young monk.

According to the Ariyapariyesanā-suttanta and the Mahāsaccaka-suttanta, the Buddha tried different spiritual paths for six years. First, he practiced yogic meditation under the guidance of Ālāra Kālāma and Uddaka Rāmaputta. After experiencing the states of concentration called base of nothingness and base of neither-perception-nor-non-perception, he realized that these lofty states did not lead to nirvana. Then the Buddha began to practice breathing exercises and fasting. The deterioration of his health led the Buddha to conclude that extreme asceticism was equally ineffective in attaining nirvana. He thus resumed eating solid food; after recovering his health, he began to practice a more moderate spiritual path, the middle path, which avoids the extremes of sensual self-indulgence and self-mortification. Soon after, the Buddha experienced enlightenment, or awakening, under a bodhi-tree. First he was inclined to inaction rather than to teaching what he had discovered. However, he changed his mind after the god Brahmā Sahampati asked him to teach. Out of compassion for all living beings, he decided to start a successful teaching career that lasted forty-five years.

d. Significance

It would be simplistic to dismiss all supernatural aspects of the Buddha’s life as false and consider historically true only those elements that are consistent with our contemporary scientific worldview. However, this approach towards the Buddha’s life was prevalent in the nineteenth century and a great part of the twentieth century. Today it is seen as problematic because it imposes modern western ideals of rationality onto non-western texts. Here I set aside the question of historical truth and speak exclusively of significance. The significance of all the biographies of Buddha does not lie in their historical accuracy, but rather in their effectiveness to convey basic Buddhist ideas and values throughout history. Even today, narratives about the many deeds of Buddha are successfully used to introduce Buddhists of all latitudes into the main values and teachings of Buddhism.

The supernatural elements of the Buddha’s life are as historically significant as the natural ones because they help to understand the way Buddhists conceived – and in many places continue to conceive – the Buddha. Like followers of other religious leaders, Buddhist scribes tended to glorify the sanctity of their foundational figure with extraordinary events and spectacular accomplishments. In this sense, the narratives of the Buddha are perhaps better understood as hagiographies rather than as biographies. The historical truth behind hagiographies is impossible to determine: how can we tell whether or not the Buddha was conceived without sexual intercourse; whether or not he was able to talk and walk right after his birth; whether or not he could walk over water, levitate, fly, and ascend into heaven at will? How do we know whether the Buddha was really tempted by Māra the evil one; whether there was an earthquake at the moment of his birth and death? The answers to these questions are a matter of faith. If the interpreter does not believe in the supernatural, then many narratives will be dismissed as historically false. However, for some Buddhists the supernatural events that appear in the life of Buddha did take place and are historically true.

The significance of the hagiographies of the Buddha is primarily ethical and spiritual. In fact, even if the life of Buddha did not take place as the hagiographies claim, the ethical values and the spiritual path they illustrate remain significant. Unlike other religions, the truth of Buddhism does not depend on the historicity of certain events in the life of the Buddha. Rather, the truth of Buddhism depends on the efficacy of the Buddhist path exemplified by the life of the Buddha and his disciples. In other words, if the different Buddhist paths inspired by the Buddha are useful to overcome existential dissatisfaction and suffering, then Buddhism is true regardless of the existence of the historical Buddha.

The fundamental ethical and spiritual point behind the Buddha’s life is that impermanent, conditioned, and contingent things such as wealth, social position, power, sensual pleasures, and even lofty meditative states, cannot generate a state of ultimate happiness. In order to overcome the profound existential dissatisfaction that all ephemeral and contingent things eventually generate, one needs to follow a comprehensive path of ethical and mental training conducive to the state of ultimate happiness called nirvana.

2. The Buddha’s Epistemology

a. The Extremes of Dogmatism and Skepticism

While the Buddha’s view of the spiritual path is traditionally described as a middle way between the extremes of self-indulgence and self-mortification, the Buddha’s epistemology can be interpreted as a middle way between the extremes of dogmatism and skepticism.

The extreme of dogmatism is primarily represented in the Pāli Nikāyas by Brahmanism. Brahmanism was a ritualistic religion that believed in the divine revelation of the Vedas, thought that belonging to a caste was determined by birth, and focused on the performance of sacrifice. Sacrifices involved the recitation of hymns taken from the Vedas and in many cases the ritual killing of animals.

Ritual sacrifices were offered to the Gods (gods for Buddhism) in exchange for prosperity, health, protection, sons, long life, and immortality. Only the male members of the highest caste, the priestly caste of Brahmins, could afford the professional space to seriously study the three Vedas (the Atharva Veda did not exist, or if it existed, it was not part yet of the Brahmanic tradition). Since only Brahmins knew the three Vedas, only they could recite the hymns necessary to properly perform the ritual sacrifice. Both ritual sacrifice and the social ethics of the caste system were seen as an expression of the cosmic order (Dharma) and as necessary to preserve that order.

Epistemologically speaking, Brahmanism emphasized the triple knowledge of the Vedas, and dogmatic faith in their content: “in regard to the ancient Brahmanic hymns that have come down through oral transmission and in the scriptural collections, the Brahmins come to the definite conclusion: ‘Only this is true, anything else is wrong’ ” (M.II.169).

The extreme of skepticism is represented in the Pāli Nikāyas by some members of the Śramanic movement, which consisted of numerous groups of spiritual seekers and wandering philosophers. The Sanskrit word “śramana” means “those who make an effort,” and probably refers to those who practice a spiritual discipline requiring individual effort, not just rituals performed by others. In order to become a śramana it was necessary to renounce one’s life as householder and enter into an itinerant life, which entailed the observance of celibacy and a simple life devoted to spiritual cultivation. Most śramanas lived in forests or in secluded places wandering from village to village where they preached and received alms in exchange.

The Śramanic movement was extremely diverse in terms of doctrines and practices. Most śramanas believed in free will as well as the efficacy of moral conduct and spiritual practices in order to attain liberation from the cycle of reincarnations. However, there was a minority of śramanas who denied the existence of the after life, free will, and the usefulness of ethical conduct and other spiritual practices. Probably as a reaction to these two opposite standpoints, some śramanas adopted a skeptic attitude denying the possibility of knowledge about such matters. Skeptics are described by the Buddha as replying questions by evasion (D.I.58-9), and as engaging in verbal wriggling, in eel-wriggling (amarāvikkhepa): “I don’t say it is like this. And I don’t say it is like that. And I don’t say it is otherwise. And I don’t say it is not so. And I don’t say it is not not so” (M.I. 521).

b. The Role of Personal Experience and the Buddha’s Wager

In contrast to Brahmanic dogmatism, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas did not claim to be omniscient (M.I.482); in fact, he proposed a critical attitude toward all sources of knowledge. In the Majjhima Nikāya (II.170-1), the Buddha challenges Brahmins who accept Vedic scriptures out of faith (saddhā) and oral tradition (anussava); he compares those who blindly follow scripture and tradition without having direct knowledge of what they believe with “a file of blind men each in touch with the next: the first one does not see, the middle one does not see, and the last one does not see.” The Buddha also warns Brahmins against knowledge based on likeability or emotional inclination (ruci), reflection on reasons (ākāraparivitakka), and consideration of theories (diṭṭhinijjhānakkhanti). These five sources of knowledge may be either true or false; that is, they do not provide conclusive grounds to claim dogmatically that “only this is true, anything else is wrong.”

Dogmatic claims of truth were not the monopoly of Brahmins. In the Majjhima Nikāya (I.178), the Buddha uses the simile of the elephant footprint to question dogmatic statements about him, his teachings, and his disciples: he invites his followers to critically investigate all the available evidence (different types of elephant footprints and marks) until they know and see for themselves (direct perception of the elephant in the open). The Pāli Nikāyas also refer to many śramanas who hold dogmatic views and as a consequence are involved in heated doctrinal disputes. The conflict of dogmatic views is often described as “a thicket of views, a wilderness of views, a contortion of views, a vacillation of views, a fetter of views. It is beset by suffering, by vexation, by despair, and by fever, and it does not lead to disenchantment, to dispassion, to cessation, to peace, to higher knowledge, to enlightentment, to Nibbāna” (M.I.485).

Public debates were common and probably a good way to gain prestige and converts. Any reputed Brahmin or śramana had to have not only the ability to speak persuasively but also the capacity to argue well. Rational argument played an important role in justifying doctrines and avoiding defeat in debate, which implied conversion to the other’s teaching. At the time of the Buddha many of these debates seem to have degenerated into dialectical battles that diverted from spiritual practice and led to disorientation, anger, and frustration. Although the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas utilizes reasoning to justify his positions in debates and conversations with others, he discourages dogmatic attachment to doctrines including his own (see the simile of the raft, M.I.135), and the use of his teachings for the sake of criticizing others and for winning debates (M.I.132).

Unlike the skepticism of some śramanas, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas takes clear stances on ethical and spiritual issues, and rejects neither the existence of right views (M.I.46-63) nor the possibility of knowing certain things as they are (yathābhūtaṃ). In order to counteract skepticism, the Buddha advises to the Kālāma people “not go by oral tradition, by succession of disciples, by hearsay, by the content of sacred scripture, by logical consistency, by inference, by reflection on reasons, by consideration of theories, by appearance, by respect to a teacher.” Instead, the Buddha recommends knowing things for oneself as the ultimate criterion to adjudicate between conflicting claims of truth (A.I.189).

When personal experience is not available to someone, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas proposes taking into account what is praised or censored by the wise, as well as a method to calculate the benefits of following certain opinions called the incontrovertible teaching (apaṇṇakadhamma), which, in some ways, resembles Pascal’s wager. According to the incontrovertible teaching, it would be better to believe in certain doctrines because they produce more benefits than others. For instance, even if there is no life after death and if good actions do not produce good consequences, still a moral person is praised in this life by the wise, whereas the immoral person is censured by society. However, if there is life after death and good action produce happy consequences, a moral person is praised in this life, and after death he or she goes to heaven. On the contrary, the immoral person is censured in this life, and after death he or she goes to hell (M.I.403). Therefore, it is better to believe that moral actions produce good consequences even if we do not have personal experience of karma and rebirth.

c. Interpretations of the Buddha’s Advice to the Kālāma People

Some have interpreted the Buddha’s advice to the Kālāma people as an iconoclast rejection of tradition and faith. This, however, does little justice to the Pāli Nikāyas, where the Buddha is said to be part of a long and respectable tradition of past Buddhas, and where the first Brahmins are sometimes commended by their holiness. The Buddha shows respect for many traditional beliefs and practices of his time, and rejects only those that are unjustified, useless, or conducive to suffering for oneself and others.

Faith in the Buddha, his teachings, and his disciples, is highly regarded in the Pāli Nikāyas: it is the first of the five factors of striving (M.II.95-6), and a necessary condition to practice the spiritual path (M.III.33). Buddhist faith, however, is not unconditional or an end in and of itself but rather a means towards direct knowledge that must be based on critical examination, supported by reasons, and eventually verified or rooted in vision (dassanamūlikā) (M.I.320).

Another common interpretation of the advice to the Kālāmas is that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas only personal experience provides reliable knowledge. However, this is misleading because analogical and inferential reasoning are widely used by the Buddha and his disciples to teach others as well as in debates with non-Buddhists. Similarly, analytical or philosophical meditation is a common practice for the attainment of liberation through wisdom. Personal experience, like any other means of knowledge is to be critically examined. Except in the case of Buddhas and liberated beings, personal experience is always tainted by affective and cognitive prejudices.

The Pāli Nikāyas might give the first impression of endorsing a form of naïve or direct realism: that is, the Buddha and his disciples seem to think that the world is exactly as we perceive it to be. While it is true that the Pāli Nikāyas do not question the common sense connection between objects of knowledge and the external world, there are some texts that might support a phenomenalist reading. For instance, the Buddha defines the world as the six senses (five ordinary senses plus the mind) and their respective objects (S.IV.95), or as the six senses, the six objects, and the six types of consciousness that arise in dependence on them (S.IV.39-40).

Here, the epistemology of the Buddha is a special form of realism that allows both for the direct perception of reality and the constructions of those less realized. Only Buddhas and liberated beings perceive the world directly; that is, they see the Dharma, whose regularity and stability remains independent of the existence of Buddhas (S.II.25). Unenlightened beings, on the other hand, see the world indirectly through a veil of negative emotions and erroneous views. Some texts go so far as to suggest that the world is not simply seen indirectly, but rather that it is literally constructed by our emotional dispositions. For instance, in the Majjhima Nikāya (I.111), the Buddha explicitly states that “what one feels, one perceives” (Yaṃ vedeti, taṃ sañjānāti). That is, our knowledge is formed by our feelings. The influence of feelings in our ways of knowing can also be inferred from the twelve-link chain of dependent arising, which explains the arising and cessation of suffering. The second link, saṅkhāra, or formations, conditions the arising of the third link, consciousness. The term saṅkhāra literally means “put together,” connoting the constructive role of the mental factors that fall into this category, many of them affective in nature.

Similarly, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas says that “with what one has mentally constructed as the root cause (Yaṃ papañceti tato nidānaṃ), perceptions, concepts, and [further] mental constructions (papañcasaññāsaṅkhā) beset a man with respect to past, future, and present forms…sounds…odours…flavors…tangibles…mind-objects cognizable by the eye…ear… nose…tongue…body…mind” (M.I.111-112). That is, the knowledge of unenlightened beings has papañca, or mental constructions, as its root cause. The word papañca is a technical term that literally means diversification or proliferation; it refers to the tendency of unenlightened minds to construct or fabricate concepts conducive to suffering, especially essentialist and ego-related concepts such as “I” and “mine,” concepts which lead to a variety of negative mental states such as craving, conceit, and dogmatic views about the self (Ñāṇananda 1971).

It is precisely because our experiences are affectively and cognitively conditioned that the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas advocates a critical approach toward all sources of knowledge, including personal experience. Even the lofty experiences derived from meditation are to be analyzed carefully because they might lead to false opinions about the nature of the self, the world, and the after life. The epistemological ideal is to know things directly beyond mental constructions (papañca), which presupposes the “tranquilization of all mental formations” (sabbasaṅkhārasamatha).

d. Higher Knowledge and the Question of Empiricism

Contemplative experiences are of two main types: meditative absorptions or abstractions (jhāna), and higher or direct knowledge (abhiññā). There are six classes of higher or direct knowledge: the first one refers to a variety of supernatural powers including levitation and walking on water; in this sense, it is better understood as a know-how type of knowledge. The second higher knowledge is literally called “divine ear element” or clairaudience. The third higher knowledge is usually translated as telepathy, though it means simply the ability to know the underlying mental state of others, not the reading of their minds and thoughts.

The next three types of higher knowledge are especially important because they were experienced by the Buddha the night of his enlightenment, and because they are the Buddhist counterparts to the triple knowledge of the Vedas. The fourth higher knowledge is retrocognition or knowledge of past lives, which entails a direct experience of the process of rebirth. The fifth is the divine eye or clairvoyance; that is, direct experience of the process of karma, or as the texts put it, the passing away and reappearing of beings in accordance with their past actions. The sixth is knowledge of the destruction of taints, which implies experiential knowledge of the four noble truths and the process of liberation.

Some scholars have interpreted the Buddha’s emphasis on direct experience and the verifiable nature of Buddhist faith as a form of radical empiricism (Kalupahana 1992), and logical empiricism (Jayatilleke 1963). According to the empiricist interpretation, Buddhist faith is always subsequent to critically verifying the available empirical evidence. All doctrines taught by the Buddha are empirically verifiable if one takes the time and effort to attain higher or direct knowledge, interpreted as extraordinary sense experience. For instance, the triple knowledge of enlightenment implies a direct experience of the processes of karma, rebirth, and the four noble truths. Critiques of the empiricist interpretation point out that, at least at the beginning of the path, Buddhist faith is not always based on empirical evidence, and that the purpose of extraordinary knowledge is not to verify the doctrines of karma, rebirth, and the four noble truths (Hoffman 1982, 1987).

Whether or not the Buddha’s epistemology can be considered empiricist depends on what we mean by empiricism and experience. The opposition between rationalism and empiricism and the sharp distinction between senses and reason is foreign to Buddhism. Nowhere in the Pāli Nikāyas does the Buddha say that all knowledge begins in or is acquired from sense experience. In this sense, the Buddha is not an empiricist.

3. The Buddha’s Cosmology and Metaphysics

a. The Universe and the Role of Gods

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas accepts the cosmology characteristic of his cultural context: a universe with several realms of existence, where people are reborn and die again and again (saṃsāra) depending on their past actions (karma) until they attain salvation (mokṣa). However, the Buddha substantially modifies the cosmology of his time. Against the Brahmanic tendency to understand karma as ritual action, and the Jain claim that all activities including involuntary actions constitute karma, the Buddha defines karma in terms of volition, or free will, which is expressed through thoughts, words, and behavior. That is, for the Buddha, only voluntary actions produce karma.

Another important modification is that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas, saṃsāra refers primarily to a psychophysical process that takes place within the physical universe. For instance, when the Buddha speaks about the end of the world, he says that it cannot be reached by traveling through the physical universe, but only by putting an end to suffering (saṃsāra), where “one is not born, does not age, does not die, does not pass away, and is not reborn” Accordingly, salvation is not understood in world-denying terms or as an escape from the physical universe, but rather as an inner transformation that takes place within one’s own psychophysical organism: “It is, friend, in just this fathom-high carcass endowed with perception and mind that I make known the world, the origin of the world, the cessation of the world, and the way leading to the cessation of the world.” (S.I.62; A.II.47-9).

There are five kinds of destinations within saṃsāra: hell, animal kingdom, realm of ghosts, humankind, and realm of devas or radiant beings, commonly translated as gods (M.I.73). There are many hells and heavens and life there is transitory, just as in other destinations. In some traditions there is another destination, the realm of asuras or demigods, who are jealous of the gods and who are always in conflict with them.

The Pāli Nikāyas further divide the universe of saṃsāra into three main planes of existence, each one subdivided into several realms. The three planes of existence are sensorial, fine-material, and immaterial (M.I.50). Most destinations belong to the sensorial realm. Only a minority of heavens belong to the fine-material and immaterial realms. Rebirth in a particular realm depends on past actions: good actions lead to good destinations and bad actions to bad rebirths. Rebirth as a human or in heaven is considered a good destination; rebirth in the realm of ghosts, hell, and the animal realm are bad. Human rebirth is extremely difficult to attain (S.V.455-6; M.III.169), and it is highly regarded because of its unique combination of pain and pleasure, as well as its unique conductivity for attaining enlightenment. In this last sense human rebirth is said to be even better than rebirth as a god.

Rebirth also depends on the prevalent mental states of a person during life, and especially at the moment of death. That is, there is a correlation between mental states and realms of rebirth, between cosmology and psychology. For instance, a mind where hatred and anger prevails is likely to be reborn in hell; deluded and uncultivated minds are headed toward the animal kingdom; someone obsessed with sex and food will probably become bound to earth as a ghost; loving and caring persons will be reborn in heaven; someone who frequently dwells in meditative absorptions will be reborn in the fine-material and immaterial realms. Human rebirth might be the consequence of any of the aforementioned mental states.

Perhaps the most important modification the Buddha introduces into the traditional cosmology of his time was a new view of Gods (gods within Buddhism). In the Pāli Nikāyas, gods do not play any significant cosmological role. For the Buddha, the universe has not been created by an all-knowing, all-powerful god that is the lord of the universe and father of all beings (M.I.326-7). Rather, the universe evolves following certain cyclic patterns of contraction and expansion (D.III.84-5).

Similarly, the cosmic order, or Dharma, does not depend on the will of gods, and there are many good deeds far more effective than ritual sacrifices offered to the gods (D.I144ff). Gods for the Buddha are unenlightened beings subject to birth and death that require further learning and spiritual practice in order to attain liberation; they are more powerful and spiritually more developed than humans and other living beings, but Buddhas excel them in all regards: spiritual development, wisdom, and power. Even the supreme type of god, Brahmā, offers his respects to the Buddha, praises him, and asks him to preach the Dharma for those with little dust in their eyes (M.I.168-9).

Since the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does not deny the existence of gods, only their cosmological and soteriological functions, it is inaccurate to define early Buddhism as atheistic or as non-theistic. The word atheistic is usually associated with anti-religious attitudes absent in the Buddha, and the term non-theistic seems to imply that rejecting the theistic concept of God is one of the main concerns of the Buddha, when in fact it is a marginal question in the Pāli Nikāyas.

b. The Four Noble Truths or Realities

One the most common frameworks to explain the basic teachings of early Buddhism is the four noble truths (ariyasacca, Sanskrit āryasatya). The word sacca means both truth and reality. The word ariya refers primarily to the ideal type of person the Buddhist path is supposed to generate, a noble person in the ethical and spiritual sense. Translating ariyasacca by ‘noble truths’ is somehow misleading because it gives the wrong impression of being a set of beliefs, a creed that Buddhists accept as noble and true. The four noble truths are primarily four realities whose contemplation leads to sainthood or the state of the noble ones (ariya). Other possible translations of ariyasacca are “ennobling truths” or “truths of the noble ones.”

Each noble truth requires a particular practice from the disciple; in this sense the four noble truths can be understood as four types of practice. The first noble truth, or the reality of suffering, assigns to the disciple the practice of cultivating understanding. Such understanding takes place gradually through reflection, analytical meditation, and eventually direct experience. What needs to be understood is the nature of suffering, and the different types of suffering and happiness within saṃsāra.

A common misconception about the first noble truth is to think that it presupposes a pessimistic outlook on life. This interpretation would be correct only if the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas had not taught the existence of different types of happiness and the third noble truth, or cessation of suffering; that is, the good news about the reality of nirvana, defined as the highest happiness (Dhp.203; M.I.505). Since the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas teaches the reality of both suffering and the highest happiness, perhaps it is more accurate to speak of his attitude as realist: there is a problem but there is also a solution to that problem.

The second noble truth, or reality of the origin of suffering, calls for the practice of renunciation to all mental states that generate suffering for oneself and others. The mental state that appears in the second noble truth is taṇhā, literally “thirst.” It was customary in the first Western translations of Buddhist texts (Burnouf, Fausboll, Muller, Oldenberg, Warren) to translate taṇhā by desire. This translation has misled many to think that the ultimate goal of Buddhists is the cessation of all desires. However, as Damien Keown puts it, “it is an oversimplification of the Buddhist position to assume that it seeks an end to all desire.” (1992: 222).

In fact, there are many terms in the Pāli Nikāyas that can be translated as desire, not all of them related to mental states conducive to suffering. On the contrary, there are many texts in the Pāli Nikāyas that demonstrate the positive role of certain types of desire in the Buddha’s path (Webster, 2005: 90-142). Nonetheless, the term taṇhā in the Pāli Nikāyas designates always a harmful type of desire that leads to “repeated existence” (ponobhavikā), is “associated with delight and lust” (nandirāgasahagatā), and “delights here and there” (tatra tatrābhinandinī) (M.I.48; D.II.308; etc). There is only one text (Nettipakaraṇa 87) that speaks about a wholesome type of taṇhā that leads to its own relinquishment, but this text is extra-canonical except in Myanmar.

The most common translation of taṇhā nowadays is craving. Unlike the loaded, vast, and ambivalent term desire, the term craving refers more specifically to a particular type of desire, and cannot be misinterpreted as conveying any want and aspiration whatsoever. Rather, like taṇhā in the Pāli Nikāyas, craving refers to intense (rāga can be translated by both lust and passion), obsessive, and addictive desires (the idiom tatra tatra can also be interpreted as connoting the idea of repetition or tendency to repeat itself).

Since craving, or taṇhā, does not include all possible types of desires, there is no “paradox of desire” in the Pāli Nikāyas. In other words, the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas does not teach that in order to attain liberation from suffering one has to paradoxically desire to stop all desires. There is no contradiction in willing the cessation of craving. That is, for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas it is possible to want, like, or strive for something without simultaneously craving for it.

The Pāli Nikāyas distinguish between three kinds of taṇhā: craving for sensual pleasures (kāmataṇhā), craving for existence (bhavataṇhā), and craving for non-existence (vibhavataṇhā). Following Webster, I understand the last two types of craving as “predicated on two extreme (wrong) views, those of eternalism and annihilationism” (2005:130-1). In other words, craving for existence longs for continued existence of one’s self within saṃsāra, and craving for non-existence is a reversed type of desire or aversion to one’s own destruction at the moment of death.

The underlying root of all suffering, however, is not craving but spiritual ignorance (avijjā). In the Pāli Nikāyas spiritual ignorance does not connote a mere lack of information but rather a misconception, a distorted perception of things under the influence of conceptual fabrications and affective prejudices. More specifically, ignorance refers to not knowing things as they are, the Dharma, and the four noble truths. The relinquishing of spiritual ignorance, craving, and the three roots of the unwholesome (greed or lobha, aversion or dosa, delusion or moha) entails the cultivation of many positive mental states, some of the most prominent in the Pāli Nikāyas being: wisdom or understanding (paññā), letting go (anupādāna), selflessness (alobha), love (avera, adosa, avyāpāda), friendliness (mettā), compassion (karuṇā), altruistic joy (muditā), equanimity (upekkhā), calm (samatha, passaddhi), mindfulness (sati), diligence (appamāda).

The third noble truth, or reality of the cessation of suffering, asks us to directly realize the destruction of suffering, usually expressed with a variety of cognitive and affective terms: peace, higher knowledge, the tranquilization of mental formations, the abandonment of all grasping, cessation, the destruction of craving, absence of lust, nirvana (Pali nibbāna). The most popular of all the terms that express the cessation of suffering and rebirth is nirvana, which literally means blowing out or extinguishing.

Metaphorically, the extinction of nirvana designates a mental event, namely, the extinguishing of the fires of craving, aversion, and delusion (S.IV.251). That nirvana primarily denotes a mental event, a psychological process, is also confirmed by many texts that describe the person who experiences nirvana with intransitive verbs such as to nirvanize (nibbāyati) or to parinirvanize (parinibbāyati). However, there are a few texts that seem to indicate that nirvana might also be a domain of perception (āyatana), element (dhātu), or reality (dhamma) known at the moment of enlightenment, and in special meditative absorptions after enlightenment. This domain is usually defined as having the opposite qualities of saṃsāra (Ud 8.1), or with metaphoric expressions (S.IV.369ff).

What is important to point out is that the concern of the Pāli Nikāyas is not to describe nirvana, which, strictly speaking, is beyond logic and language (It 37), but rather to provide a systematic explanation of the arising and cessation of suffering. The goal of Buddhism as it appears in the Pāli Nikāyas does not consist in believing that suffering arises and ceases like the Buddha says, but in realizing that what he teaches about suffering and its cessation is the case; that is, the Buddha’s teaching, or Dharma, is intended to be experienced by the wise for themselves (M.I.265).

The fourth noble truth, or reality of the path leading to the cessation of suffering, imposes on us the practice of developing the eightfold ennobling path. This path can be understood either as eight mental factors that are cultivated by ennobled disciples at the moment of liberation, or as different parts of the entire Buddhist path whose practice ennoble the disciple gradually. The eight parts of the Buddhist path are usually divided into three kinds of training: training in wisdom (right view and right intention), ethical training (right speech, right bodily conduct, and right livelihood), and training in concentration (right effort, right mindfulness and right concentration).

c. Ontology of Suffering: the Five Aggregates

A prominent concern of the Buddha in the Pāli Nikāyas is to provide a solution to the problem of suffering. When asked about his teachings, the Buddha answers that he only teaches suffering and its cessation (M.I.140). The first noble truth describes what the Buddha means by suffering: birth, aging, illness, death, union with what is displeasing, separation from what is pleasing, not getting what one wants, the five aggregates of grasping (S.V.421).

The original Pali term for suffering is dukkha, a word that ordinarily means physical and mental pain, but that in the first noble truth designates diverse kinds of frustration, and the existential angst generated by the impermanence of life and the unavoidability of old age, disease, and death. However, when the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas mentions birth and the five aggregates of grasping, he seems to be referring to the fact that our psychophysical components are conditioned by grasping, and consequently, within saṃsāra, the cycle of births and deaths. This interpretation is consistent with later Buddhist tradition, which speaks about three types of dukkha: ordinary suffering (mental and physical pain), suffering due to change (derived from the impermanence of things), and suffering due to conditions (derived from being part of saṃsāra).

When the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas speaks about personal identity and the human predicament, he uses the technical expression “five aggregates of grasping” (pañcupādānakkhandhā). That is, the Buddha describes human existence in terms of five groups of constituents. The five aggregates are: material form (rūpa), sensations (vedanā), perceptions (saññā), mental formations (saṃkhāra), consciousness (viññāṇa). While the first aggregate refers to material components, the other four designate a variety of mental functions.

The aggregate material form is explained as the four great elements and the shape or figure of our physical body. The four great elements are earth, water, fire, and air. The earth element is further defined as whatever is solid in our body, and water as whatever is liquid. The fire element refers to “that by which one is warmed, ages, and is consumed,” and the process of digestion. The air element denotes the breathing process and movements of gas throughout the body (M.I.185ff).

The aggregate sensations denote pleasant, unpleasant and neutral feelings experienced after there is contact between the six sense organs (eye, ear, nose, tongue, body, and mind) and their six objects (forms, sounds, odors, tastes, tangible objects, and mental phenomena). The aggregate perceptions express the mental function by which someone is able to identify objects. There are six types of perceptions corresponding to the six objects of the senses. The aggregate formations express emotional and intellectual dispositions, literally volitions (sañcetanâ), towards the six objects of the senses. These dispositions are the result of past cognitive and affective conditioning, that is, past karma or past voluntary actions. The aggregate consciousness connotes the ability to know and to be aware of the six objects of the senses (S.III.59ff).

d. Arguments for the Doctrine of Non-self

The Buddha reiterates again and again throughout the Pāli Nikāyas that any of the five aggregates “whether past, future or present, internal or external, gross or subtle, inferior or superior, far or near, ought to be seen as it actually is with right wisdom thus: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self.’ ” When the disciple contemplates the five aggregates in this way, he or she becomes disenchanted (nibbindati), lust fades away (virajjati), and he or she attains liberation due to the absence of lust (virāgā vimuccati) (M.I.138-9).

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas justifies this view of the five aggregates as non-self with three main arguments, which are used as a method of analytical meditation, and in polemics with members of other schools. The assumption underlying the Buddha’s arguments is that something might be considered a self only if it were permanent, not leading to suffering, not dependently arisen, and subject to one’s own will. Since none of the five aggregates fulfill any of these conditions, it is wrong to see them as belonging to us or as our self.

In the first and most common argument for non-self the Buddha asks someone the following questions: “What do you think, monks, is material form permanent or impermanent?” – “Impermanent, venerable sir.” – “Is what is impermanent suffering or happiness?” – “Suffering, venerable sir.” –Is what is impermanent, suffering, and subject to change, fit to be regarded as: “this is mine, this I am, this is my self?” – “No, venerable sir” (M.I.138, etc). The same reasoning is applied to the other aggregates.

The first argument is also applied to the six sensual organs, the six objects, the six types of consciousness, perceptions, sensations, and formations that arise dependent on the contact between the senses and their objects (M.III.278ff). Sometimes the first argument for non-self is applied to the six senses and their objects without questions and answers: “Monks, the visual organ is impermanent. What is impermanent is suffering. What is suffering is non-self. What is non-self ought to be seen as it really is with right wisdom thus: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self’ ” (S.IV.1ff).

The second argument for non-self is much less frequent: “Monks, material form is non-self. If it were self, it would not lead to affliction. It would be possible [to say] with regard to material form: ‘Let my material form be thus. Let my material form not be thus.’ But precisely because it is non-self, it leads to affliction. And it is not possible [to say] with regard to material form: ‘Let my material form be thus. Let my material form not be thus’ ”(S.III.66-7). The same reasoning is applied to the other four aggregates.

The third argument deduces non-self from that fact that physical and mental phenomena depend on certain causes to exist. For instance, in (M.III.280ff), the Buddha first analyzes the dependent arising of physical and mental phenomena. Then he argues: “If anyone says: ‘the visual organ is self,’ that is unacceptable. The rising and falling of the visual organ are fully known (paññāyati). Since the rising and falling of the visual organ are fully known, it would follow that: ‘my self arises and falls.’ Therefore, it is unacceptable to say: ‘the visual organ is self.’ Thus the visual organ is non-self.” The same reasoning is applied to the other senses, their objects, and the six types of consciousness, contacts (meeting of sense, object and consciousness), sensations, and cravings derived from them.

The third argument also appears combined with the first one without questions and answers. For instance, in (A.V.188), it is said that “whatever becomes, that is conditioned, volitionally formed, dependently arisen, that is impermanent. What is impermanent, that is suffering. What is suffering, that is [to be regarded thus]: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self.’ ”

If something can be inferred from these three arguments, it is that the target of the doctrine of non-self is not all concepts of self but specifically views of the self as permanent and not dependently arisen. That is, the doctrine of non-self opposes what is technically called “views of personal identity” or more commonly translated “personality views” (sakkāyadiṭṭhi). Views of personal identity relate the five aggregates to a permanent and independent self in four ways: as being identical, as being possession of the self, as being in the self, or as the self being in them (M.I.300ff). All these views of personal identity are said to be the product of spiritual ignorance, that is, of not seeing with right wisdom the true nature of the five aggregates, their origin, their cessation, and the way leading to their cessation.

e. Human Identity and the Meaning of Non-self

Since the Pāli Nikāyas accept the common sense usages of the word “self” (attan, Skt. ātman), primarily in idiomatic expressions and as a reflexive pronoun meaning “oneself,” the doctrine of non-self does not imply a literal negation of the self. Similarly, since the Buddha explicitly criticizes views that reject karma and moral responsibility (M.I.404ff), the doctrine of non-self should not be understood as the absolute rejection of moral agency and any concept of personal identity. In fact, the Buddha explicitly defines “personal identity” (sakkāya) as the five aggregates (M.I.299).

Since the sixth sense, or mind, includes the four mental aggregates, and since the ordinary five senses and their objects fall under the aggregate of material form, it can be said that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas personal identity is defined not only in terms of the five aggregates, but also in terms of the six senses and their six objects.

If the meaning of non-self were that there is literally no self whatsoever, no personal identity and no moral agency whatsoever, then the only logical conclusion would be to state that the Buddha taught nonsense and that the Pāli Nikāyas are contradictory, sometimes accepting the existence of a self and other times rejecting it. Even though no current scholar of Buddhism would endorse such an interpretation of non-self, it is still popular in some missionary circles and apologetic literature.

A more sympathetic interpretation of non-self distinguishes between two main levels of discourse (Collins 1982). The first level of discourse does not question the concept of self and freely uses personal terms and expressions in accordance with ordinary language and social conventions. The second level of discourse is philosophically more sophisticated and rejects views of self and personal identity as permanent and not dependently arisen. Behind the second level of discourse there is a technical understanding of the self and personal identity as the five aggregates, that is, as a combination of psychophysical processes, all of them impermanent and dependently originated.

This concept of the self as permanent and not dependently arisen is problematic because it is based on a misperception of the aggregates. This misperception of the five aggregates is associated with what is technically called “the conceit I am” (asmimāna) and “the underlying tendency to the conceits ‘I’ and ‘mine’ ” (ahaṃkāra-mamaṅkāra-mānānusaya). This combination of conceit and ignorance fosters different types of cravings, especially craving for immortal existence, and subsequently, speculations about the past, present, and future nature of the self and personal identity. For instance, in (D.I.30ff), the Buddha speaks of different ascetics and Brahmins who claim that the self after death is “material, immaterial, both material and immaterial, neither material nor immaterial, finite, infinite, both, neither, of uniform perception, of varied perception, of limited perception, of unlimited perception, wholly happy, wholly miserable, both, neither.” The doctrine of non-self is primarily intended to counteract views of the self and personal identity rooted in ignorance regarding the nature of the five aggregates, the conceit “I am,” and craving for immortal existence.

A minority of scholars reject the notion that the Buddha’s doctrine of non-self implies the negation of the true self, which for them is permanent and independent of causes and conditions. Accordingly, the purpose of the doctrine of non-self is simply to deny that the five aggregates are the true self. The main reason for this interpretation is that the Buddha does not say anywhere in the Pāli Nikāyas that the self does not exist; he only states that a self and what belongs to a self are not apprehended (M.I.138). Therefore, for these interpreters the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas only claims that impermanent and conditioned things like the five aggregates are not the true self. For these scholars, the Buddha does talk about the true self when he speaks about the consciousness of liberated beings (M.I.140), and the unconditioned, unborn and deathless nirvana (Bhattacarya 1973; Pérez Remón 1981).

However, the majority of Buddhist scholars agree with the traditional Buddhist self-understanding: they think that the doctrine of non-self is incompatible with any doctrine about a permanent and independent self, not just with views that mistakenly identify an alleged true self with the five aggregates. The main reason for this interpretation relates to the doctrine of dependent arising.

f. Causality and the Principle of Dependent Arising

The importance of dependent arising (paṭiccasamuppāda) cannot be underestimated: the Buddha realized its workings during the night of his enlightenment (M.I.167). Preaching the doctrine of dependent arising amounts to preaching the Dharma (M.II.32), and whoever sees it sees the Dharma (M.I.191). The Dharma of dependent arising remains valid whether or not there are Buddhas in the world (S.II.25), and it is through not understanding it that people are trapped into the cycle of birth and death (D.II.55).

The doctrine of dependent arising can be formulated in two ways that usually appear together: as a general principle or as a chain of causal links to explain the arising and ceasing of suffering and the process of rebirth. The general principle of dependent arising states that “when this exists, that comes to be; with the arising of this, that arises. When this does not exist, that does not come to be; with the cessation of this, that ceases” (M.II.32; S.II.28).

Unlike the logical principle of conditionality, the principle of dependent arising does not designate a connection between two ideas but rather an ontological relationship between two things or events within a particular timeframe. Dependent arising expresses not only the Buddha’s understanding of causality but also his view of things as interrelated. The point behind dependent arising is that things are dependent on specific conditions (paṭicca), and that they arise together with other things (samuppāda). In other words, the principle of dependent arising conveys both ontological conditionality and the constitutive relativity of things. This relativity, however, does not mean that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas everything is interdependent or that something is related to everything else. This is a later development of Buddhist thought, not a characteristic of early Indian Buddhism.

The most comprehensive chain of dependent arising contains twelve causal links: (1) ignorance, (2) formations, (3) consciousness, (4) mentality-materiality, (5) the six senses, (6) contact, (7) sensations, (8) craving (9) grasping, (10) becoming, (11) birth, (12) old age and death. The most common formulation is as follows: with 1 as a condition 2 [comes to be]; with 2 as a condition 3 [comes to be], and so forth. Conversely, with the cessation of 1 comes the cessation of 2; with the cessation of 2 comes the cessation of 3, and so forth.

It is important to keep in mind that this chain does not imply a linear understanding of causality where the antecedent link disappears once the subsequent link has come to be. Similarly, each of the causal links is not to be understood as the one and only cause that produces the next link but rather as the most necessary condition for its arising. For instance, ignorance, the first link, is not the only cause of the process of suffering but rather the cause most necessary for the continuation of such a process. For the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas, as well as for later Buddhist tradition, there is always a multiplicity of causes and conditions at play.

The traditional interpretation divides the twelve link chain of dependent arising into three lives. The first two links (ignorance and formations) belong to the past life: due to a misperception of the nature of the five aggregates, a person (the five aggregates) performs voluntary actions: mental, verbal, and bodily actions, with wholesome, unwholesome, and neutral karmic effects. The next ten factors correspond to the present life: the karmic effects of past voluntary formations are stored in consciousness and transferred to the next life. Consciousness together with the other mental aggregates combines with a new physical body to constitute a new psychophysical organism (mentality-materiality). This new stage of the five aggregates develops the six senses and the ability to establish contact with their six objects. Contacts with objects of the senses produce pleasant, unpleasant and neutral sensations. If the sensations are pleasant, the person usually responds with cravings for more pleasant experiences, and if the sensations are unpleasant, with aversion. Craving and aversion, as well as the underlying ignorance of the nature of the five aggregates are fundamental causes of suffering and rebirth: the three roots of the unwholesome according to the Pāli Nikāyas, or the three mental poisons according to later Buddhist traditions.

By repeating the affective responses of craving and aversion, the person becomes more and more dependent on whatever leads to more pleasant sensations and less unpleasant ones. This creates a variety of emotional dependencies and a tendency to grasp or hold onto what causes pleasure and avoids pain. The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas speaks about four types of grasping: towards sensual pleasures, views, rites-and-observances, and especially towards doctrines of a [permanent and independent] self (D.II.57-8).

The original term for grasping is upādāna, which also designates the fuel or supply necessary to maintain a fire. In this sense, grasping is the psychological fuel that maintains the fires of craving, aversion, and delusion, the fires whose extinction is called nirvana. The Buddha’s ideal of letting go and detachment should not be misunderstood as the absence of any emotions whatsoever including love and compassion, but specifically as the absence of emotions associated with craving, aversion, and delusion. Motivated by grasping and the three mental fires, the five aggregates perform further voluntary actions, whose karmic effects perpetuate existence within the cycle of rebirth and subsequent suffering. The last two links (birth, aging and death) refer to the future life. At the end of this present existence, a new birth of the five aggregates will take place followed by old age, death, and other kinds of suffering.

The twelve-link chain of dependent arising explains the processes of rebirth and suffering without presupposing a permanent and independent self. The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas makes this point explicit in his passionate rebuttal of the monk Sāti, who claimed that it is the same consciousness that wanders through the cycle of rebirth. For the Buddha, consciousness, like the other eleven causal links, is dependent on specific conditions (M.I.258ff), which entails that consciousness is impermanent, suffering, and non-self.

Instead of a permanent and independent self behind suffering and the cycle of rebirth, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas presupposes five psychophysical sets of processes, namely, the five aggregates, which imply an impermanent and dependently-arisen concept of ‘self’ and ‘personal identity.’ In other words, the Buddha rejects substance-selves but accepts process-selves (Gowans 2003). Yet, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas explicitly refuses to use personal terms such as ‘self’ in technical explanations of rebirth and suffering, and he prefers to speak in terms of causes and conditions that produce other causes and conditions (S.II.13-4; S.II.62; M.III.19). But what happens to consciousness and the other aggregates when grasping no longer exists and the three mental fires have been extinguished? What happens when suffering ceases and the cycle of rebirth stops?

4. Nirvana and the Silence of the Buddha

a. Two Kinds of Nirvana and the Undetermined Questions

When the fires of craving, aversion, and ignorance are extinguished at the moment of enlightenment, the aggregates are liberated due to the lack of grasping. This is technically called nirvana with remainder of grasping (saupādisesa-nibbāna), or as later tradition puts it, nirvana of mental defilements (kilesa-parinibbāna). The expression ‘remainder of grasping’ refers to the five aggregates of liberated beings, which continue to live after enlightenment but without negative mental states.

The aggregates of the liberated beings perform their respective functions and, like the aggregates of anybody else, they grow old, get sick, and are subject to pleasant and unpleasant sensations until death. The difference between unenlightened and enlightened beings is that enlightened beings respond to sensations without craving or aversion, and with higher knowledge of the true nature of the five aggregates.

The definition of nirvana without remainder (anupādisesa-nibbāna) that appears in (It 38) only says that for the liberated being “all that is experienced here and now, without enchantment [another term for grasping], will be cooled (sīta).” Since “all” is defined in the Pāli Nikāyas as the six senses and their six objects (S.IV.15), which is another way of describing the individual psychophysical experience or the five aggregates, the expression “all that is experienced” refers to what happens to the aggregates of liberated beings. Since (It 38) explicitly uses the expression “here and now” (idheva), it seems impossible to conclude that the definition of nirvana without remainder is intended to say anything about nirvana or the aggregates beyond death. Rather (It 38) describes nirvana and the aggregates at the moment of death: they will be no longer subject to rebirth and they will become cooled, tranquil, at peace. The question is: what does this peace or coolness entail? What happens after the nirvana of the aggregates? Does the mind of enlightened beings survive happily ever after? Does the liberated being exist beyond death or not?

These questions are left undetermined (avyākata) by the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas. The ten questions in the the Pāli Nikāyas ask whether (1) The world is eternal; (2) The world is not eternal; (3) The world is infinite; (4) The world is finite; (5) Body and soul are one thing; (6) Body and soul are two different things; (7) A liberated being (tathāgata) exists after death; (8) A liberated being (tathāgata) does not exist after death; (9) A liberated being (tathāgata) both exists and does not exist after death; (10) A liberated being (tathāgata) neither exists nor does not exist after death. In Sanskrit Buddhist texts the ten views become fourteen by adding the last two possibilities of the tetralema (both A and B, neither A nor B) to the questions about the world.

Unfortunately for those looking for quick answers, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does not provide a straightforward yes or no response to any of these questions. When the Buddha is asked whether the liberated being exists, does not exist, both, or neither, he sets aside these questions by saying that (1) he does not hold such views, (2) he has left the questions undetermined, and (3) the questions do not apply (na upeti). The first two answers are also used to respond to questions about the temporal and spatial finitude or infinitude of the world, and the identity or difference between the soul and the body. Only the third type of answer is given to the questions about liberated beings after death.

Most presentations of early Buddhism interpret these three answers of the Buddha as an eloquent silence about metaphysical questions due primarily to pragmatic reasons, namely, the questions divert from spiritual practice and are not conducive to liberation from suffering. While the pragmatic reasons for the answers of the Buddha are undeniable, it is inaccurate to understand them as silence about metaphysical questions. In fact, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does address many metaphysical issues with his teachings of non-self and dependent arising.

The answers of the Buddha to the undetermined questions are due not only to pragmatic reasons but also to metaphysical reasons: the questions are inconsistent with the doctrines of non-self and dependent arising because they assume the existence of a permanent and independent self, a self that is either finite or infinite, identical or different from the body, existing or not existing after death. Besides pragmatic and metaphysical reasons, there are cognitive and affective reasons for the answers of the Buddha: the undetermined questions are based on ignorance about the nature of the five aggregates and craving for either immortal existence or inexistence. The questions are expressions of ‘identity views,’ that is, they are part of the problem of suffering. Answering the questions directly would have not done any good: a yes answer would have fostered more craving for immortal existence and led to eternalist views, and a no answer would have fostered further confusion and led to nihilist views (S.IV.400-1).

In the case of the undetermined questions about the liberated being, there are also apophatic reasons for answering “it does not apply.” The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas illustrates the inapplicability of the questions with the simile of the fire extinct: just as it does not make sense to ask about the direction in which an extinct fire has gone, it is inappropriate to ask about the status of the liberated being beyond death: “The fire burned in dependence on its fuel of grass and sticks. When that is used up, if it does not get any more fuel, being without fuel, it is reckoned as extinguished. Similarly, the enlightened being has abandoned the five aggregates by which one might describe him…he is liberated from reckoning in terms of the five aggregates, he is profound, immeasurable, unfathomable like the ocean” (M.I.487-8).

b. Eternalism, Nihilism, and the Middle Way

There are three possible interpretations of the simile of the extinct fire: (1) liberated beings no longer exist beyond death (2) liberated beings exist in a mysterious unfathomable way beyond death (3) the Buddha is silent about both the liberated being and nirvana after death. The first interpretation seems the most logical conclusion given the Buddha’s ontology of suffering and the doctrine of non-self. However, the nihilist interpretation makes Buddhist practice meaningless and contradicts texts where the Buddha criticizes teachings not conducive to spiritual practice such as materialism and determinism (M.I.401ff). But more importantly, the nihilist interpretation is vehemently rejected in the Pāli Nikāyas: “As I am not, as I do not proclaim, so have I been baselessly, vainly, falsely, and wrongly misrepresented by some ascetics and brahmins thus: ‘the ascetic Gotama [Buddha] is one who leads astray; he teaches the annihilation, the destruction, the extermination of an existing being’ ”(M.I.140).

The second interpretation appears to some as following from the Buddha’s incontrovertible response to the nihilist reading of his teachings: since the Buddha rejects nihilism, he must somehow accept the eternal existence of liberated beings, or at least the eternal existence of nirvana. For eternalist interpreters, the texts in the Pāli Nikāyas that speak about the transcendence and ineffability of liberated beings and nirvana can be understood as implying their existence after or beyond death.

There are several eternalist readings of the Buddha’s thought. We have already mentioned the most common: the doctrine of non-self merely states that the five aggregates are not the true self, which is the transcendent and ineffable domain of nirvana. However, there are eternalist interpretations within Buddhism too. That is, interpretations that are nominally consistent with the doctrine of non-self but that nevertheless speak of something as eternally existing: either the mind of liberated beings or nirvana. For instance, Theravāda Buddhists usually see nirvana as non-self, but at the same time as an unconditioned (asaṃkhata) and deathless (amata) reality. The assumption, though rarely stated, is that liberated beings dwell eternally in nirvana without a sense of “I” and “mine,” which is a transcendent state beyond the comprehension of unenlightened beings. Another eternalist interpretation is that of the Dalai Lama who, following the standard interpretation of Tibetan Buddhists, claims that the Buddha did not teach the cessation of all aggregates but only of contaminated aggregates. That is, the uncontaminated aggregates of liberated beings continue to exist individually beyond death, though they are seen as impermanent, dependently arisen, non-self, and empty of inherent existence (Dalai Lama 1975:27). Similarly, Peter Harvey understands nirvana as a selfless and objectless state of consciousness different from the five aggregates that exists temporarily during life and eternally beyond death (1995: 186-7).

The problem with eternalist interpretations is that they contradict what the Pāli Nikāyas say explicitly about the way to consider liberated beings, the limits of language, the content of the Buddha’s teachings, and dependent arising as a middle way between the extremes of eternalism and annihilationism. In (S.III.110ff), Sāriputta, the Buddha’s leading disciple in doctrinal matters, explains that liberated beings should be considered neither as annihilated after death nor as existing without the five aggregates.

In (D.II.63-4) the Buddha makes clear that consciousness and mentality-materiality, that is, the five aggregates, are the limits of designation (adhivacana), language (nirutti), cognitions (viññatti), and understanding (paññā). Accordingly, in (D.II.68) the Buddha says it is inadequate to state that the liberated being exists after death, does not exist, both, or neither. This reading is confirmed by (Sn 1076): “There is not measure (pamāṇa) of one who has gone out, that by which [others] might speak (vajju) of him does not exist. When all things have been removed, then all ways of speech (vādapathā) are also removed.”

Given the Buddha’s understanding of the limits of language and understanding in the Pāli Nikāyas, it is not surprising that he responded to the accusation of teaching the annihilation of beings, by saying that “formerly and now I only teach suffering and the cessation of suffering.” Since the Buddha does not teach anything beyond the cessation of suffering at the moment of death, that is, beyond the limits of language and understanding, it is inaccurate to accuse him of teaching the annihilation of beings. Similarly, stating that liberated beings exist after death in a mysterious way beyond the four logical possibilities of existence, non-existence, both or neither, is explicitly rejected in (S.III.118-9) and (S.IV.384), where once again the Buddha concludes that he only makes known suffering and the cessation of suffering.

If the eternalist interpretation were correct, it would have been unnecessary for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas to put so much emphasis on the teaching of dependent arising. Why would dependent arising be defined in (S.II.17) as right view and as the middle way between the extremes of eternalism and annihilationism if the truth were that the consciousness of liberated beings or the unconditioned nirvana exist eternally? If knowing and seeing dependent arising precludes someone from speculating about a permanent self in the past and the future (M.I.265), why would the Buddha teach anything about the eternal existence of liberated beings and nirvana?

In order to avoid the aforementioned contradictions entailed by eternalist readings of the Pāli Nikāyas, all texts about nirvana and the consciousness of liberated beings are to be understood as referring to this life or the moment of death, never to some mysterious consciousness or domain that exists beyond death. Since none of the texts about nirvana and liberated beings found in the Pāli Nikāyas refer unambiguously to their eternal existence beyond death, I interpret the Buddha as being absolutely silent about nirvana and liberated beings beyond death (Vélez de Cea 2004a). In other words, nothing of what the Pāli Nikāyas say goes beyond the limits of language and understanding, beyond the content of the Buddha’s teachings, and beyond dependent arising as the middle way between eternalism and annihilationism.

Instead of focusing on nirvana and liberated beings beyond death, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas emphasizes dependent arising and the practice of the four foundations of mindfulness. Dependent arising is intended to avoid views about a permanent and independent self in the past and the future (M.I.265; M.III.196ff), and the four foundations of mindfulness are said to be taught precisely to destroy such views (D.III.141). That is, the Buddha’s fundamental concern is to address the problem of suffering in the present without being distracted by views about the past or the future: “Let not a person revive the past, or on the future build his hopes; for the past has been left behind and the future has not been reached. Instead with insight let him see each presently arising state (paccuppannañca yo dhammaṃ tattha tattha vipassati); let him know that and be sure of it, invincibly, unshakeably. Today the effort must be made, tomorrow death may come, who knows?” (Bhikkhu Bodhi’s translation. M.III.193).

5. Buddhist Ethics

Early Buddhist ethics includes more than lists of precepts and more than the section on ethical training of the eightfold noble path; that is, Buddhist ethics cannot be reduced to right action (abstaining from killing, stealing, lying), right speech (abstaining from false, divisive, harsh, and useless speech), and right livelihood (abstaining from professions that harm living beings). Besides bodily and verbal actions, the Pāli Nikāyas discuss a variety of mental actions including thoughts, motivations, emotions, and perspectives. In fact, it is the ethics of mental actions that constitutes the main concern of the Buddha’s teaching.

Early Buddhist ethics encompasses the entire spiritual path, that is, bodily, verbal, and mental actions. The factors of the eightfold noble path dealing with wisdom and concentration (right view, right intentions, rights effort, right concentration, right mindfulness) relate to different types of mental actions. The term “right” (sammā) in this context does not mean the opposite of “wrong,” but rather “perfect” or “complete;” that is, it denotes the best or the most effective actions to attain liberation. This, however, does not imply that the Buddha advocates the most perfect form of ethical conduct for all his disciples.

Early Buddhist ethics is gradualist in the sense that there are diverse ways of practicing the path with several degrees of commitment; not all disciples are expected to practice Buddhist ethics with the same intensity. Monks and nuns take more precepts and are supposed to devote more time to spiritual practices than householders. However, a complete monastic code (prātimoka) like those found in later Vinaya literature does not appear in the Pāli Nikāyas. The most comprehensive formulation of early Buddhist ethics, probably common to monastic disciples and lay people, is the list of ten dark or unwholesome actions and their opposite, the ten bright or wholesome actions: three bodily actions (abstaining from killing, stealing, sexual misconduct), four verbal actions (abstaining from false, divisive, harsh, and useless speech), and tree mental actions (abstaining from covetousness, ill-will, and dogmatic views).

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas defines action in terms of intention or choice (cetanā): “It is intention, monks, what I call action. Having intended, someone acts through body, speech, and mind” (A.III.415). The Pāli Nikāyas define the roots of unwholesome (akusala) actions as greed (lobha), aversion (dosa), and delusion (moha). Conversely, the roots of wholesome actions are defined as the opposite mental states (M.I.47). Some scholars infer from these two definitions that Buddhist ethics is an ethics of intention or an agent-based form of virtue ethics. That is, according to these scholars, for the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas, only the agent’s intention or motivation determine the goodness of actions. This interpretation, however, is disproved by many texts of the Pāli Nikāyas where good and evil actions are discussed without any reference to the underlying intention or motivation of the agent. Consequently, the more comprehensive account understands intention not as the only factor that determines the goodness of actions, but rather as the condition of possibility, the necessary condition for speaking about action in the moral sense. Without intention or choice, there is no ethical action. Similarly, motivation, while a central moral factor in Buddhist ethics, is neither the only factor nor always the most important factor to determine the goodness of actions. Understanding Buddhist ethics as concerned exclusively with the three roots of the wholesome does not fully capture the breath of moral concern of the Pāli Nikāyas (Vélez de Cea 2004b).

The fundamental moral law of the universe according to early Buddhism is what is popularly called the “law of karma”: good actions produce good consequences, and bad actions lead to bad consequences. The consequences of volitional actions can be experienced in this life or in subsequent lives. Although not everything we experience is due to past actions, physical appearance, character, lifespan, prosperity, and rebirth destination are believed to be influenced by past actions. This influence however, is not to be confused with fatalism, a position rejected in the Pāli Nikāyas. There is always room for mitigating and even eradicating the negative consequences of past actions with new volitions in the present. That is, past karma does not dictate our situation: the existence of freewill and the possibility of changing our predicament is always assumed. There is conditioning of the will and other mental factors, but no hard determinism.

A common objection to early Buddhist ethics is how there can be freewill and responsibility without a permanent self that transmigrates through lives. If there is no self, who is the agent of actions? Who experiences the consequences of actions? Is the person who performs an action in this life the same person that experiences the consequences of that action in a future life? Is it a different person? The Buddha considers these questions improper of his disciples, who are trained to explain things in terms of causes and condition (S.II.61ff; S.II.13ff)). In other words, since the Buddha’s disciples explain processes with the doctrine of dependent arising, they should avoid explanations that use personal terms and presuppose the extremes of eternalism and nihilism. The moral agent is not a substance-self but rather the five aggregates, a dynamic and dependently-arisen process-self who, like a flame or the water of a river, changes all the time and yet has some degree of continuity.

The most common interpretations of early Buddhist ethics view its nature as either a form of agent-based virtue ethics or as a sophisticated kind of consequentialism. The concern for virtue cultivation is certainly prevalent in early Buddhism, and evidently the internal mental state or motivation underlying actions is extremely important to determine the overall goodness of actions, which is the most important factor for advanced practitioners. Similarly, the concern for the consequences of actions, whether or not they lead to the happiness or the suffering of oneself and others, also pervades the Pāli Nikāyas. However, the goodness of actions in the Pāli Nikāyas does not depend exclusively on either the goodness of motivations or the goodness of consequences. Respect to status and duty, observance of rules and precepts, as well as the intrinsic goodness of certain external bodily and verbal actions are equally necessary to assess the goodness of at least certain actions. Since the foundations of right action in the Pāli Nikāyas are irreducible to one overarching principle, value or criterion of goodness, early Buddhist ethics is pluralistic in a metaethical sense. Given the unique combination of deontological, consequentialist, and virtue ethical trends found in the Pāli Nikāyas, early Buddhist ethics should be understood in its own terms as a sui generis normative theory inassimilable to Western ethical traditions.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

All references to the Pāli Nikāyas are to the edition of The Pāli Text Society, Oxford. References to the Aṅguttara, Dīgha, Majjhima, and Saṃyutta Nikāyas are to the volume and page number. References to Udāna and Itivuttaka are to the page number and to Dhammapada and Sutta Nipāta to the verse number.

A. Aṅguttara Nikāya

D. Dīgha Nikāya

M. Majjhima Nikāya

S. Saṃyutta Nikāya

Ud. Udāna

It. Itivuttaka

Dhp. Dhammapada

Sn. Sutta Nipāta

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bechert, H. (Ed) 1995. When Did the Buddha Live? The Controversy on the Dating of the Historical Buddha. Selected Papers Based on a Symposium Held under the Auspices of the Academy of Sciences in Göttingen. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications. 1995.
  • Bhattacharya, K. 1973. L´Ātman-Brahman dans le Bouddhisme Ancien. París: EFEO.
  • Bhikkhu Ñānamoli and Bhikkhu Bodhi. 1995. The Middle Length Discourses of the Buddha. A New Translation of the Majjhima Nikāya. Kandy: Buddhist Publication Society.
  • Bhikkhu Ñāṇananda. 1971. Concept and Reality in Early Buddhist Thought. Kandy: Buddhist Publication Society.
  • Cousins, L.S. 1996. “Good or Skillful? Kusala in Canon and Commentary.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics.Vol. 3: 133-164.
  • Collins, S. 1982. Selfless Persons. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Collins, S. 1994. “What are Buddhists Doing When They Deny the Self?” In Religion and Practical Reason, edited by Frank E. Reynolds and David Tracy. Albany: SUNY.
  • Collins, S. 1998. Nirvana and other Buddhist Felicities. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Dalai Lama. 1994. The Way to Freedom. San Francisco: Harper.
  • Dharmasiri, G. 1996. Fundamentals of Buddhist Ethics. Singapore: Buddhist Research Society.
  • Fuller, P. 2005. The Notion of Diṭṭhi in Theravāda Buddhism. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Gombrich, R. 1988. Theravāda Buddhism: A Social History from Ancient Benares to Modern Colombo. London: Routledge.
  • Gombrich, R. 1996. How Buddhism Began. London: Athlone.
  • Gethin, R. 2001. The Buddhist Path to Awakening. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Gowans, C. W. 2003. Philosophy of the Buddha. London: Routledge.
  • Hallisey, C. 1996. “Ethical Particularism in Theravāda Buddhism.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics. Vol. 3: 32-34.
  • Hamilton, S. 2000. Early Buddhism: A New Approach. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Harvey, P. 1995. The Selfless Mind: Personality, Consciousness, and Nirvana in Early Buddhism. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Harvey, P. 1995. “Criteria for Judging the Unwholesomeness of Actions in the Texts of Theravāda Buddhism.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics. Vol. 2: 140-151.
  • Harvey, P. 2000. An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hoffman, F. J. 1987. Rationality and Mind in Early Buddhism. New Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Hwang, S. 2006. Metaphor and Literalism in Buddhism: The Doctrinal History of Nirvana. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Jayatilleke, K. N. 1963. Early Buddhist Theory of Knowledge. London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Johansson, R. 1969. The Psychology of Nirvana. London: Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • Kalupahana, D. 1976. Buddhist Philosophy: A Historical Analysis. Honolulu: University Press of Hawai’i.
  • Kalupahana, D. 1992. A History of Buddhist Philosophy: Continuities and Discontinuities. Honolulu: University Press of Hawai’i.
  • Keown, D. 1992. The Nature of Buddhist Ethics. New York: Palgrave.
  • Norman, K. R. 1983. Pāli Literature: Including the Canonical Literature in Prakrit and Sanskrit of all the Hīnayāna schools of Buddhism. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • Norman, K. R. 1990-6. Collected Papers. Oxford: The Pāli Text Society.
  • Pande, G.C. 1995. Studies in the Origins of Buddhism. New Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Pérez-Remón, J. 1980. Self and Non-Self in Early Buddhism. New York: Mouton.
  • Perret, R. 1986. “Egoism, Altruism, and Intentionalism in Buddhist Ethics.” Journal of IndianPhilosophy. Vol. 15: 71-85.
  • Premasiri, P. D. 1987. “Early Buddhist Concept of Ethical Knowledge: A Philosophical Analysis.” Kalupahana, D.J. and Weeraratne, W.G. eds. Buddhist Philosophy and Culture: Essays in Honor of N.A. Jayawickrema. Colombo: N.A. Jayawickrema Felicitation Volume Committee. Pp. 37-70.
  • Ronkin, N. 2005. Early Buddhist Metaphysics: The Making of a Philosophical Tradition. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Tilakaratne, A. 1993. Nirvana and Ineffability: A Study of the Buddhist Theory of Reality and Languague. Colombo: Karunaratne and Sons.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2004 a. “The Silence of the Buddha and the Questions about the Tathāgata after Death.” The Indian International Journal of Buddhist Studies, no 5.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2004 b. “The Early Buddhist Criteria of Goodness and the Nature of Buddhist Ethics.”Journal of Buddhist Ethics 11, pp.123-142.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2005. “Emptiness in the Pāli Suttas and the Question of Nāgārjuna’s Orthodoxy.”Philosophy East and West. Vol. 55: 4.
  • Webster, D. 2005. The Philosophy of Desire in the Pali Canon. London: RoutledgeCurzon.

See also the Encylopedia articles on Madhyamaka Buddhism and Pudgalavada Buddhism.

Author Information

Abraham Velez
Eastern Kentucky University
U. S. A.


In its central use "phenomenology" names a movement in twentieth century philosophy. A second use of "phenomenology" common in contemporary philosophy names a property of some mental states, the property they have if and only if there is something it is like to be in them. Thus, it is sometimes said that emotional states have a phenomenology while belief states do not.  For example, while there is something it is like to be angry, there is nothing it is like to believe that Paris is in France. Although the two uses of "phenomenology" are related, it is the first which is the current topic.  Accordingly, "phenomenological" refers to a way of doing philosophy that is more or less closely related to the corresponding movement. Phenomenology utilizes a distinctive method to study the structural features of experience and of things as experienced. It is primarily a descriptive discipline and is undertaken in a way that is largely independent of scientific, including causal, explanations and accounts of the nature of experience. Topics discussed within the phenomenological tradition include the nature of intentionality, perception, time-consciousness, self-consciousness, awareness of the body and consciousness of others. Phenomenology is to be distinguished from phenomenalism, a position in epistemology which implies that all statements about physical objects are synonymous with statements about persons having certain sensations or sense-data. George Berkeley was a phenomenalist but not a phenomenologist.

Although elements of the twentieth century phenomenological movement can be found in earlier philosophers—such as David Hume, Immanuel Kant and Franz Brentano—phenomenology as a philosophical movement really began with the work of Edmund Husserl. Following Husserl, phenomenology was adapted, broadened and extended by, amongst others, Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Emmanuel Levinas and Jacques Derrida. Phenomenology has, at one time or another, been aligned with Kantian and post-Kantian transcendental philosophy, existentialism and the philosophy of mind and psychology.

This article introduces some of the central aspects of the phenomenological method and also concrete phenomenological analyses of some of the topics that have greatly exercised phenomenologists.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Phenomenological Method
    1. Phenomena
    2. Phenomenological Reduction
    3. Eidetic Reduction
    4. Heidegger on Method
  3. Intentionality
    1. Brentano and Intentional Inexistence
    2. Husserl's Account in Logical Investigations
    3. Husserl's Account in Ideas I
    4. Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty on Intentionality
  4. Phenomenology of Perception
    1. Naïve Realism, Indirect Realism and Phenomenalism
    2. Husserl's Account: Intentionality and Hyle
    3. Husserl's Account: Internal and External Horizons
    4. Husserl and Phenomenalism
    5. Sartre Against Sensation
  5. Phenomenology and the Self
    1. Hume and the Unity of Consciousness
    2. Kant and the Transcendental I
    3. Husserl and the Transcendental Ego
    4. Sartre and the Transcendent Ego
  6. Phenomenology of Time-Consciousness
    1. The Specious Present
    2. Primal Impression, Retention and Protention
    3. Absolute Consciousness
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The work often considered to constitute the birth of phenomenology is Husserl's Logical Investigations (Husserl 2001). It contains Husserl's celebrated attack on psychologism, the view that logic can be reduced to psychology; an account of phenomenology as the descriptive study of the structural features of the varieties of experience; and a number of concrete phenomenological analyses, including those of meaning, part-whole relations and intentionality.

Logical Investigations seemed to pursue its agenda against a backdrop of metaphysical realism. In Ideas I (Husserl 1982), however, Husserl presented phenomenology as a form of transcendental idealism. This apparent move was greeted with hostility from some early admirers of Logical Investigations, such as Adolph Reinach. However, Husserl later claimed that he had always intended to be a transcendental idealist. In Ideas I Husserl offered a more nuanced account of the intentionality of consciousness, of the distinction between fact and essence and of the phenomenological as opposed to the natural attitude.

Heidegger was an assistant to Husserl who took phenomenology in a rather new direction. He  married Husserl's concern for legitimating concepts through phenomenological description with an overriding interest in the question of the meaning of being, referring to his own phenomenological investigations as "fundamental ontology." His Being and Time (Heidegger 1962) is one of the most influential texts on the development of European philosophy in the Twentieth Century. Relations between Husserl and Heidegger became strained, partly due to the divisive issue of National Socialism, but also due to significant philosophical differences. Thus, unlike his early works, Heidegger's later philosophy bears little relation to classical Husserlian phenomenology.

Although he published relatively little in his lifetime, Husserl was a prolific writer leaving a large number of manuscripts. Alongside Heidegger's interpretation of phenomenology, this unpublished work had a decisive influence on the development of French existentialist phenomenology. Taking its lead from Heidegger's account of authentic existence, Sartre's Being and Nothingness (Sartre 1969) developed a phenomenological account of consciousness, freedom and concrete human relations that perhaps defines the term "existentialism." Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception (Merleau-Ponty 1962) is distinctive both in the central role it accords to the body and in the attention paid to the relations between phenomenology and empirical psychology.

Although none of the philosophers mentioned above can be thought of straightforwardly as classical Husserlian phenomenologists, in each case Husserl sets the phenomenological agenda. This remains the case, with a great deal of the contemporary interest in both phenomenological methodology and phenomenological topics drawing inspiration from Husserl's work. Accordingly, Husserl's views are the touchstone in the following discussion of the topics, methods and significance of phenomenology.

2. Phenomenological Method

Husserlian phenomenology is a discipline to be undertaken according to a strict method. This method incorporates both the phenomenological and eidetic reductions.

a. Phenomena

Phenomenology is, as the word suggests, the science of phenomena. But this just raises the questions: "What are phenomena?" and "In what sense is phenomenology a science?".

In answering the first question, it is useful to briefly turn to Kant. Kant endorsed "transcendental idealism," distinguishing between phenomena (things as they appear) and noumena (things as they are in themselves), claiming that we can only know about the former (Kant 1929, A30/B45). On one reading of Kant, appearances are in the mind, mental states of subjects. On another reading, appearances are things as they appear, worldly objects considered in a certain way.

Both of these understandings of the nature of phenomena can be found in the phenomenological literature. However, the most common view is that all of the major phenomenologists construe phenomena in the latter way: phenomena are things as they appear. They are not mental states but worldly things considered in a certain way. The Phenomenologists tend, however, to reject Kantian noumena. Also, importantly, it is not to be assumed that the relevant notion of appearing is limited to sensory experience. Experience (or intuition) can indeed be sensory but can, at least by Husserl's lights, be understood to encompass a much broader range of phenomena (Husserl 2001, sec. 52). Thus, for example, although not objects of sensory experience, phenomenology can offer an account of how the number series is given to intuition.

Phenomenology, then, is the study of things as they appear (phenomena). It is also often said to be descriptive rather than explanatory: a central task of phenomenology is to provide a clear, undistorted description of the ways things appear (Husserl 1982, sec. 75). This can be distinguished from the project of giving, for example, causal or evolutionary explanations, which would be the job of the natural sciences.

b. Phenomenological Reduction

In ordinary waking experience we take it for granted that the world around us exists independently of both us and our consciousness of it. This might be put by saying that we share an implicit belief in the independent existence of the world, and that this belief permeates and informs our everyday experience. Husserl refers to this positing of the world and entities within it as things which transcend our experience of them as "the natural attitude" (Husserl 1982, sec. 30). In The Idea of Phenomenology, Husserl introduces what he there refers to as "the epistemological reduction," according to which we are asked to supply this positing of a transcendent world with "an index of indifference" (Husserl 1999, 30). In Ideas I, this becomes the "phenomenological epoché," according to which, "We put out of action the general positing which belongs to the essence of the natural attitude; we parenthesize everything which that positing encompasses with respect to being" (Husserl 1982, sec. 32). This means that all judgements that posit the independent existence of the world or worldly entities, and all judgements that presuppose such judgements, are to be bracketed and no use is to be made of them in the course of engaging in phenomenological analysis. Importantly, Husserl claims that all of the empirical sciences posit the independent existence of the world, and so the claims of the sciences must be "put out of play" with no use being made of them by the phenomenologist.

This epoché is the most important part of the phenomenological reduction, the purpose of which is to open us up to the world of phenomena, how it is that the world and the entities within it are given. The reduction, then, is that which reveals to us the primary subject matter of phenomenology—the world as given and the givenness of the world; both objects and acts of consciousness.

There are a number of motivations for the view that phenomenology must operate within the confines of the phenomenological reduction. One is epistemological modesty. The subject matter of phenomenology is not held hostage to skepticism about the reality of the "external" world. Another is that the reduction allows the phenomenologist to offer a phenomenological analysis of the natural attitude itself. This is especially important if, as Husserl claims, the natural attitude is one of the presuppositions of scientific enquiry. Finally, there is the question of the purity of phenomenological description. It is possible that the implicit belief in the independent existence of the world will affect what we are likely to accept as an accurate description of the ways in which worldly things are given in experience. We may find ourselves describing things as "we know they must be" rather than how they are actually given.

The reduction, in part, enables the phenomenologist to go "back to the 'things themselves'"(Husserl 2001, 168), meaning back to the ways that things are actually given in experience. Indeed, it is precisely here, in the realm of phenomena, that Husserl believes we will find that indubitable evidence that will ultimately serve as the foundation for every scientific discipline. As such, it is vital that we are able to look beyond the prejudices of common sense realism, and accept things as actually given. It is in this context that Husserl presents his Principle of All Principles which states that, "every originary presentive intuition is a legitimizing source of cognition, that everything originally (so to speak, in its 'personal' actuality) offered to us in 'intuition' is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there" (Husserl 1982, sec. 24).

c. Eidetic Reduction

The results of phenomenology are not intended to be a collection of particular facts about consciousness, but are rather supposed to be facts about the essential natures of phenomena and their modes of givenness. Phenomenologists do not merely aspire to offer accounts of what their own experiences of, say, material objects are like, but rather accounts of the essential features of material object perception as such. But how is this aspiration to be realized given that the method of phenomenology is descriptive, consisting in the careful description of experience? Doesn't this, necessarily, limit phenomenological results to facts about particular indviduals' experience, excluding the possibility of phenomenologically grounded general facts about experience as such?

The Husserlian answer to this difficulty is that the phenomenologist must perform a second reduction called "eidetic" reduction (because it involves a kind of vivid, imagistic intuition). The purpose of the eidetic reduction in Husserl's writings is to bracket any considerations concerning the contingent and accidental, and concentrate on (intuit) the essential natures or essences of the objects and acts of consciousness (Husserl 1982, sec. 2). This intuition of essences proceeds via what Husserl calls "free variation in imagination." We imagine variations on an object and ask, "What holds up amid such free variations of an original […] as the invariant, the necessary, universal form, the essential form, without which something of that kind […] would be altogether inconceivable?" (Husserl 1977, sec. 9a). We will eventually come up against something that cannot be varied without destroying that object as an instance of its kind. The implicit claim here is that if it is inconceivable that an object of kind K might lack feature F, then F is a part of the essence of K.

Eidetic intuition is, in short, an a priori method of gaining knowledge of necessities. However, the result of the eidetic reduction is not just that we come to knowledge of essences, but that we come to intuitive knowledge of essences. Essences show themselves to us (Wesensschau), although not to sensory intuition, but to categorial or eidetic intuition (Husserl 2001, 292-4). It might be argued that Husserl's methods here are not so different from the standard methods of conceptual analysis: imaginative thought experiments (Zahavi 2003, 38-39).

d. Heidegger on Method

It is widely accepted that few of the most significant post-Husserlian phenomenologists accepted Husserl's prescribed methodology in full. Although there are numerous important differences between the later phenomenologists, the influence of Heidegger runs deep.

On the nature of phenomena, Heidegger remarks that "the term 'phenomenon'…signifies 'to show itself'" (Heidegger 1962, sec. 7). Phenomena are things that show themselves and the phenomenologist describes them as they show themselves. So, at least on this score there would appear to be some affinity between Husserl and Heidegger. However, this is somewhat controversial, with some interpreters understanding Husserlian phenomena not as things as given, but as states of the experiencing subject (Carman 2006).

It is commonly held that Heidegger reject's the epoché: "Heidegger came to the conclusion that any bracketing of the factual world in phenomenology must be a crucial mistake" (Frede 2006, 56). What Heidegger says in his early work, however, is that, for him, the phenomenological reduction has a different sense than it does for Husserl:

For Husserl, phenomenological reduction… is the method of leading phenomenological vision from the natural attitude of the human being whose life is involved in the world of things and persons back to the transcendental life of consciousness…. For us phenomenological reduction means leading phenomenological vision back from the apprehension of a being…to the understanding of the being of this being.
(Heidegger 1982, 21)

Certainly, Heidegger thinks of the reduction as revealing something different—the Being of beings. But this is not yet to say that his philosophy does not engage in bracketing,for we can distinguish between the reduction itself and its claimed consequences. There is, however, some reason to think that Heidegger's position is incompatible with Husserl's account of the phenomenological reduction. For, on Husserl's account, the reduction is to be applied to the "general positing" of the natural attitude, that is to a belief. But, according to Heidegger and those phenomenologists influenced by him (including both Sartre and Merleau-Ponty), our most fundamental relation to the world is not cognitive but practical (Heidegger 1962, sec. 15).

Heidegger's positive account of the methods of phenomenology is explicit in its ontological agenda. A single question dominates the whole of Heidegger's philosophy: What is the meaning of being? To understand this, we can distinguish between beings (entities) and Being. Heidegger calls this "the ontological difference."  According to Heidegger, "ontology is the science of Being. But Being is always the being of a being. Being is essentially different from a being, from beings…We call it the ontological difference—the differentiation between Being and beings" (Heidegger 1982, 17). Tables, chairs, people, theories, numbers and universals are all beings. But they all have being, they all are. An understanding at the level of beings is "ontical," an understanding at the level of being is "ontological". Every being has being, but what does it mean to say of some being that it is? Might it be that what it means to say that something is differs depending on what sort of thing we are talking about? Do tables, people, numbers have being in the same way? Is there such a thing as the meaning of being in general? The task is, for each sort of being, to give an account of the structural features of its way of Being, "Philosophy is the theoretical conceptual interpretation of being, of being's structure and its possibilities" (Heidegger 1982, 11).

According to Heidegger, we have a "pre-ontological" understanding of being: "We are able to grasp beings as such, as beings, only if we understand something like being. If we did not understand, even though at first roughly and without conceptual comprehension, what actuality signifies, then the actual would remain hidden from us…We must understand being so that we may be able to be given over to a world that is" (Heidegger 1982, 10-11). Our understanding of being is manifested in our "comportment towards beings" (Heidegger 1982, 16). Comportment is activity, action or behaviour. Thus, the understanding that we have of the Being of beings can be manifested in our acting with them. One's understanding of the being of toothbrushes, for example, is manifested in one's capacity for utilizing toothbrushes. Understanding need not be explicit, nor able to be articulated conceptually. It is often embodied in "know-how." This is the sense, on Heidegger's account, that our most fundamental relation to the world is practical rather than cognitive. It is this that poses a challenge to the phenomenological reduction.

Heidegger's relation to the eidetic reduction is complex. The purpose of the eidetic reduction in Husserl's writings is to bracket any considerations concerning the contingent and accidental, and concentrate on (intuit) the essential natures of the objects and acts of consciousness. Heidegger's concentration on the meaning of the Being of entities appears similar in aim. However, insofar as the Being of entities relies on the notion of essence, Heidegger's project calls it into question. The idea that there are different "ways of being" looks as though it does not abide by the traditional distinction between existence and essence. So, on Heidegger's account, what it takes for something to have being is different for different sorts of thing.

3. Intentionality

How is it that subjective mental processes (perceptions, thoughts, etc.) are able to reach beyond the subject and open us up to an objective world of both worldly entities and meanings? This question is one that occupied Husserl perhaps more than any other, and his account of the intentionality of consciousness is central to his attempted answer.

Intentionality is one of the central concepts of Phenomenology from Husserl onwards. As a first approximation, intentionality is aboutness or directedness as exemplified by mental states. For example, the belief that The Smiths were from Manchester is about both Manchester and The Smiths. One can also hope, desire, fear, remember, etc. that the Smiths were from Manchester.

Intentionality is, say many, the way that subjects are "in touch with" the world. Two points of terminology are worth noting. First, in contemporary non-phenomenological debates, "intentional" and its cognates is often used interchangeably with "representational" and its cognates. Second, although they are related, "intentionality" (with a "t")  is not to be confused with "intensionality" (with an "s"). The former refers to aboutness (which is the current topic), the latter refers to failure of truth-preservation after substitution of co-referring terms.

a. Brentano and Intentional Inexistence

Franz Brentano, Husserl's one time teacher, is the origin of the contemporary debate about intentionality. He famously, and influentially claimed:

Every mental phenomenon is characterised by what the Scholastics of the Middle Ages called the intentional (or mental) inexistence of an object, and what we might call, though not wholly unambiguously, reference to a content, direction towards an object (which is not to be understood here as meaning a thing) or immanent objectivity. Every mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself, although they do not all do so in the same way. In presentation, something is presented, in judgement something is affirmed or denied, in love loved, in hate hated, in desire desired and so on.
(Brentano 1995, 88)

Brentano thought that all and only psychological states exhibit intentionality, and that in this way the subject matter of psychology could be demarcated. His, early and notorious, doctrine of intentional inexistence maintains that the object of an intentional state is literally a part of the state itself, and is, therefore, an "immanent" psychological entity. This position is based on Brentano's adherence to (something like) the first interpretation of the Kantian notion of phenomena mentioned above (Crane 2006).

b. Husserl's Account in Logical Investigations

Since phenomenology is descriptive, Husserl's aim is to describe (rather than explain or reduce) intentionality. Husserl differs from Brentano in that he thinks that, apart from some special cases, the object of an intentional act is a transcendent object. That is, the object of an intentional act is external to the act itself (Husserl 2001, 126-7) (Husserl's "acts" are not to be thought of as actions, or even as active. For example, on Husserl's view, a visual experience is a conscious act (Husserl 2001, 102)). The object of the belief that Paris is the capital of France is Paris (and France). This is in keeping with the suggestion above that when phenomenologists describe phenomena, they describe worldly things as they are presented in conscious acts, not mental entities.

Intentionality is not a relation, but rather an intrinsic feature of intentional acts. Relations require the existence of their relata (the things related to one another), but this is not true of intentionality (conceived as directedness towards a transcendent object). The object of my belief can fail to exist (if my belief is, for example, about Father Christmas). On Husserl's picture, every intentional act has an intentional object, an object that the act is about, but they certainly needn't all have a real object (Husserl 2001, 127).

Husserl distinguishes between the intentional matter (meaning) of a conscious act and its intentional quality, which is something akin to its type (Husserl 2001, 119-22). Something's being a belief, desire, perception, memory, etc. is its intentional quality. A conscious act's being about a particular object, taken in a particular way, is its intentional matter. An individual act has a meaning that specifies an object. It is important to keep these three distinct. To see that the latter two are different, note that two intentional matters (meanings) can say the same thing of the same object, if they do it in a different way. Compare: Morrissey wrote "I know it's Over," and The lead singer of the Smiths wrote the second track on The Queen is Dead. To see that the first two (act and meaning) are distinct, on Husserl's view, meanings are ideal (that is, not spatio-temporal), and therefore transcend the acts that have them (Husserl 2001, 120). However, intentional acts concretely instantiate them. In this way, psychological subjects come into contact with both ideal meaning and the worldly entities meant.

c. Husserl's Account in Ideas I

In his Ideas I, Husserl introduced a new terminology to describe the structure of intentionality. He distinguished between the noesis and the noema, and he claimed that phenomenology involved both noetic and noematic analysis (Husserl 1982, pt. 3, ch.6). The noesis is the act of consciousness; this notion roughly corresponds to what Husserl previously referred to as the "intentional quality." Thus, noetic analysis looks at the structure of conscious acts and the ways in which things are consciously intended. The noema is variously interpreted as either the intentional object as it is intended or the ideal content of the intentional act. Thus, noematic analysis looks at the structure of meaning or objects as they are given to consciousness. Exactly how to interpret Husserl's notions of the noema and noematic analysis are much debated (Smith 2007, 304-11), and this debate goes right to the heart of Husserlian phenomenology.

d. Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty on Intentionality

On Husserl's view, intentionality is aboutness or directedness as exemplified by conscious mental acts. Heidegger and, following him, Merleau-Ponty broaden the notion of intentionality, arguing that it fails to describe what is in fact the most fundamental form of intentionality. Heidegger argues:

The usual conception of intentionality…misconstrues the structure of the self-directedness-toward….  An ego or subject is supposed, to whose so-called sphere intentional experiences are then supposed to belong…. [T]he mode of being of our own self, the Dasein, is essentially such that this being, so far as it is, is always already dwelling with the extant. The idea of a subject which has intentional experiences merely inside its own sphere and is not yet outside it but encapsulated within itself is an absurdity.
(Heidegger 1982, 63-4)

Heidegger introduces the notion of comportment as a meaningful directedness towards the world that is, nevertheless, more primitive than the conceptually structured intentionality of conscious acts, described by Husserl (Heidegger 1982, 64). Comportment is an implicit openness to the world that continually operates in our habitual dealings with the world. As Heidegger puts it, we are "always already dwelling with the extant".

Heidegger's account of comportment is related to his distinction, in Being and Time, between the present-at-hand and the ready-to-hand. These describe two ways of being of worldly entities. We are aware of things as present-at-hand, or occurrent, through what we can call the "theoretical attitude." Presence-at-hand is the way of being of things—entities with determinate properties.
Thus, a hammer, seen through the detached contemplation of the theoretical attitude, is a material thing with the property of hardness, woodenness etc. This is to be contrasted with the ready-to-hand. In our average day-to-day comportments, Dasein encounters equipment as ready-to-hand,
"The kind of Being which equipment possesses - in which it manifests itself in its own right - we call 'readiness-to-hand'" (Heidegger 1962, sec. 15). Equipment shows itself as that which is in-order-to, that is, as that which is for something. A pen is equipment for writing, a fork is equipment for eating, the wind is equipment for sailing, etc. Equipment is ready-to-hand, and this means that it is ready to use, handy, or available. The readiness-to-hand of equipment is its manipulability in our dealings with it.

A ready-to-hand hammer has various properties, including Being-the-perfect-size-for-the-job-at-hand. Heidegger claims that these "dealings" with "equipment" have their own particular kind of "sight": "[W]hen we deal with them [equipment] by using them and manipulating them, this activity is not a blind one; it has its own kind of sight, by which our manipulation is guided... the sight with which they thus accommodate themselves is circumspection" (Heidegger 1962, sec. 15). Circumspection is the way in which we are aware of the ready-to-hand. It is the kind of awareness that we have of "equipment" when we are using it but are not explicitly concentrating on it or contemplating it, when it recedes. For example, in driving, one is not explicitly aware of the wheel. Rather, one knowledgeably use it; one has "know how." Thus, circumspection is the name of our mode of awareness of the ready-to-hand entities with which Dasein comports in what, on Heidegger's view, is the most fundamental mode of intentionality.

Merleau-Ponty's account of intentionality introduces, more explicitly than does Heidegger's, the role of the body in intentionality. His account of "motor intentionality" treats bodily activities, and not just conscious acts in the Husserlian sense, as themselves intentional. Much like Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty describes habitual, bodily activity as a directedness towards worldly entities that are for something, what he calls "a set of manipulanda" (Merleau-Ponty 1962, 105). Again, like Heidegger, he argues that motor intentionality is a basic phenomenon, not to be understood in terms of the conceptually articulated intentionality of conscious acts, as described by Husserl. As Merleau-Ponty says, "it is the body which 'catches' and 'comprehends movement'. The acquisition of a habit is indeed the grasping of a significance, but it is the motor grasping or a motor significance" (Merleau-Ponty 1962, 142-3). And again, "it is the body which 'understands'" (Merleau-Ponty 1962, 144).

4. Phenomenology of Perception

Perceptual experience is one of the perennial topics of phenomenological research. Husserl devotes a great deal of attention to perception, and his views have been very influential. We will concentrate, as does Husserl, on the visual perception of three dimensional spatial objects. To understand Husserl's view, some background will be helpful.

a. Naïve Realism, Indirect Realism and Phenomenalism

We ordinarily think of perception as a relation between ourselves and things in the world. We think of perceptual experience as involving the presentation of three dimensional spatio-temporal objects and their properties. But this view, sometimes known as naïve realism, has not been the dominant view within the history of modern philosophy. Various arguments have been put forward in an attempt to show that it cannot be correct. The following is just one such:

  1. If one hallucinates a red tomato, then one is aware of something red.
  2. What one is aware of cannot be a red tomato (because there isn't one); it must be a private, subjective entity (call this a sense datum).
  3. It is possible to hallucinate a red tomato while being in exactly the same bodily states as one would be in if one were seeing a red tomato.
  4. What mental/experiential states people are in are determined by what bodily states they are in.
  5. So: When one sees a red tomato, what one is (directly) aware of cannot be a red tomato but must be a private, subjective entity (a sense datum).

The conclusion of this argument is incompatible with naïve realism. Once naïve realism is rejected, and it is accepted that perception is a relation, not to an ordinary worldly object, but to a private mental object, something must be said about the relation between these two types of object. An indirect realist view holds that there really are both kinds of object. Worldly objects both cause and are represented by sense data. However, this has often been thought to lead to a troubling skepticism regarding ordinary physical objects: one could be experiencing exactly the same sense data, even if there were no ordinary physical objects causing one to experience them. That is, as far as one's perceptual experience goes, one could be undergoing one prolonged hallucination. So, for all one knows, there are no ordinary physical objects.

Some versions of a view known as phenomenalism answer this skeptical worry by maintaining that ordinary physical objects are nothing more than logical constructions out of (collections of) actual and possible sense data. The standard phenomenalist claim is that statements about ordinary physical objects can be translated into statements that refer only to experiences (Ayer 1946). A phenomenalist might claim that the physical object statement "there is a white sheep in the kitchen" could be analysed as "if one were to currently be experiencing sense-data as of the inside of the kitchen, then one would experience a white, sheep-shaped sense-datum." Of course, the above example is certainly not adequate. First, it includes the unanalysed physical object term "kitchen." Second, one might see the kitchen but not the sheep. Nevertheless, the phenomenalist is committed to the claim that there is some adequate translation into statements that refer only to experiences.

b. Husserl's Account: Intentionality and Hyle

However, another route out of the argument from hallucination is possible. This involves the denial that when one suffers a hallucination there is some object of which one is aware. That is, one denies premise 1 of the argument. Intentional theories of perception deny that perceptual experience is a relation to an object. Rather, perception is characterised by intentionality. The possibility of hallucinations is accounted for by the fact that my perceptual intentions can be inaccurate or "non-veridical." When one hallucinates a red tomato, one "perceptually intends" a red tomato, but there is none. One's conscious experience has an intentional object, but not a real one.

This, of course, is the fundamental orientation of Husserl's view. In sensory perception we are intentionally directed toward a transcendent object. We enjoy, "concrete intentive mental processes called perceivings of physical things" (Husserl 1982, sec. 41). Further, Husserl takes this view to be consistent with the intuition that in part drives naïve realism, that in perception we are aware of three-dimensional physical things, not subjective mental representations of them. As Husserl writes, "The spatial physical thing which we see is, with all its transcendence, still something perceived, given 'in person' in the manner peculiar to consciousness" (Husserl 1982, sec. 43). If the intentional account of perceptual experience is correct, we can agree that naïve realism is false while avoiding the postulation of private sense data.

But if perceiving is characterised by intentionality, what distinguishes it from other intentional phenomena, such as believing? What is the difference between seeing that there is a cat on the mat and believing that there is a cat on the mat? Part of Husserl's answer to this is that perception has a sensory character. As one commentary puts it, "The authentic appearance of an object of perception is the intentional act inasmuch and to the extent that this act is interwoven with corresponding sensational data" (Bernet, Kern, and Marbach 1993, 118). The "sensational data" (also called hyle) are non-intentional, purely sensory aspects of experience. Sensory data are, on Husserl's account, "animated" by intentions, which "interpret" them (Husserl 1982, 85). Thus, although perception is an intentional phenomenon, it is not purely intentional; it also has non-intentional, sensory qualities. In contemporary debates over intentionality and consciousness, those who believe that experiences have such non-intentional qualities are sometimes said to believe in qualia.

c. Husserl's Account: Internal and External Horizons

When we visually perceive a three-dimensional, spatial object, we see it from one particular perspective. This means that we see one of its sides at the expense of the others (and its insides). We see a profile, aspect or, as Husserl puts it, "adumbration." Should we conclude from this that the other sides of the object are not visually present? Husserl thinks not, claiming that a more phenomenologically adequate description of the experience would maintain that, "Of necessity a physical thing can be given only 'one-sidedly;'... A physical thing is necessarily given in mere 'modes of appearance' in which necessarily a core of 'what is actually presented' is apprehended as being surrounded by a horizon of 'co-givenness'" (Husserl 1982, sec. 44).

Husserl refers to that which is co-given as a "horizon," distinguishing between the internal and external horizons of a perceived object (Husserl 1973, sec. 8). The internal horizon of an experience includes those aspects of the object (rear aspect and insides) that are co-given. The external horizon includes those objects other than those presented that are co-given as part of the surrounding environment. In visual experience we are intentionally directed towards the object as a whole, but its different aspects are given in different ways.

Husserl often uses the term "anticipation" to describe the way in which the merely co-presented is present in perceptual experience. As he says, "there belongs to every external perception its reference from the 'genuinely perceived' sides of the object of perception to the sides 'also meant'—not  yet perceived, but only anticipated and, at first, with a non-intuitional emptiness... the perception has horizons made up of other possibilities of perception, as perceptions that we could have, if we actively directed the course of perception otherwise" (Husserl 1960, sec. 19). In these terms, only the front aspect of an object is "genuinely perceived." Its other features (rear aspect and insides) are also visually present, but by way of being anticipated. This anticipation consists, in part, in expectations of how the object will appear in subsequent experiences. These anticipations count as genuinely perceptual, but they lack the "intuitional fullness" of the fully presented. The non-intuitional emptiness of the merely co-given can be brought into intuitional fullness precisely by making the previously co-given rear aspect fully present, say, by moving around the object. Perceptual anticipations have an "if...then..." structure, that is, a perceptual experience of an object is partly constituted by expectations of how it would look were one to see it from another vantage point.

d. Husserl and Phenomenalism

Above, phenomenalism was characterised in two ways. On one, the view is that ordinary physical objects are nothing more than logical constructions out of (collections of) actual and possible sense data. One the other, the view is that statements about ordinary physical objects can be translated into statements that refer only to experiences. But, in fact, these views are not equivalent. The first, but not the second, is committed to the existence of sense data.

Husserl's intentional account of perception does not postulate sense data, so he is not a phenomenalist of the first sort. However, there is some reason to believe that he may be a phenomenalist of the second sort. Concerning unperceived objects, Husserl writes:

That the unperceived physical thing "is there" means rather that, from my actually present perceptions, with the actually appearing background field, possible and, moreover, continuously-harmoniously motivated perception-sequences, with ever new fields of physical things (as unheeded backgrounds) lead to those concatenations of perceptions in which the physical thing in question would make its appearance and become seized upon.
(Husserl 1982, sec. 46)

Here Husserl seems to be claiming that what it is for there to be a currently unperceived object  is for one to have various things given, various things co-given and various possibilities of givenness. That is, he appears to endorse something that looks rather like the second form of phenomenalism—the view that statements about physical objects can be translated into statements that only make reference to actual and possible appearances. Thus, there is some reason to think that Husserl may be a phenomenalist, even though he rejects the view that perceptual experience is a relation to a private, subjective sense datum.

e. Sartre Against Sensation

Sartre accepts, at least in broad outline, Husserl's view of intentionality (although he steers clear of Husserl's intricate detail). Intentionality, which Sartre agrees is characteristic of consciousness, is directedness toward worldly objects and, importantly for Sartre, it is nothing more than this. He writes, "All at once consciousness is purified, it is clear as a strong wind. There is nothing in it but a movement of fleeing itself, a sliding beyond itself" (Sartre 1970, 4). Consciousness is nothing but a directedness elsewhere, towards the world. Sartre's claim that consciousness is empty means that there are no objects or qualities in consciousness. So, worldly objects are not in consciousness; sense data are not in consciousness; qualia are not in consciousness; the ego is not in consciousness. In so far as these things exist, they are presented to consciousness. Consciousness is nothing more than directedness toward the world. Thus, Sartre rejects Husserl's non-intentional, purely sensory qualities.

A test case for Sartre's view concerning the emptiness of consciousness is that of bodily sensation (for example, pain). A long tradition has held that bodily sensations, such as pain, are non-intentional, purely subjective qualities (Jackson 1977, chap. 3). Sartre is committed to rejecting this view. However, the most obvious thing with which to replace it is the view according to which bodily sensations are perceptions of the body as painful, or ticklish, etc. On such a perceptual view, pains are experienced as located properties of an object—one's body. However, Sartre also rejects the idea that when one is aware of one's body as subject (and being aware of something as having pains is a good candidate for this), one is not aware of it as an object (Sartre 1969, 327). Thus, Sartre is committed to rejecting the perceptual view of bodily sensations.

In place of either of these views, Sartre proposes an account of pains according to which they are perceptions of the world. He offers the following example:

My eyes are hurting but I should finish reading a philosophical work this evening…how is the pain given as pain in the eyes? Is there not here an intentional reference to a transcendent object, to my body precisely in so far as it exists outside in the world? [...] [P]ain is totally void of intentionality…. Pain is precisely the eyes in so far as consciousness "exists them"…. It is the-eyes-as-pain or vision-as-pain; it is not distinguished from my way of apprehending transcendent words.
(Sartre 1969, 356)

Bodily sensations are not given to unreflective consciousness as located in the body. They are indicated by the way objects appear. Having a pain in the eyes amounts to the fact that, when reading, "It is with more difficulty that the words are detached from the undifferentiated ground" (Sartre 1969, 356). What we might intuitively think of as an awareness of a pain in a particular part of the body is nothing more than an awareness of the world as presenting some characteristic difficulty. A pain in the eyes becomes an experience of the words one is reading becoming indistinct, a pain in the foot might become an experience of one's shoes as uncomfortable.

5. Phenomenology and the Self

There are a number of philosophical views concerning both the nature of the self and any distinctive awareness we may have of it. Husserl's views on the self, or ego, are best understood in relation to well known discussions by Hume and Kant. Phenomenological discussions of the self and self-awareness cannot be divorced from issues concerning the unity of consciousness.

a. Hume and the Unity of Consciousness

Hume's account of the self and self-awareness includes one of the most famous quotations in the history of philosophy. He wrote:

There are some philosophers, who imagine we are every moment intimately conscious of what we call our SELF; that we feel its existence and its continuance in existence…. For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, or heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I never can catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe anything but the perception.
(Hume 1978, 251-2)

Hume claims that reflection does not reveal a continuously existing self. Rather, all that reflection reveals is a constantly changing stream of mental states. In Humean terms, there is no impression of self and, as a consequence of his empiricism, the idea that we have of ourselves is rendered problematic. The concept self is not one which can be uncritically appealed to.

However, as Hume recognized, this appears to leave him with a problem, a problem to which he could not see the answer: "...all my hopes vanish when I come to explain the principles, that unite our successive perceptions in our thought or consciousness" (Hume 1978, 635-6). This problem concerns the unity of consciousness. In fact there are at least two problems of conscious unity.

The first problem concerns the synchronic unity of consciousness and the distinction between subjects of experience. Consider four simultaneous experiences: e1, e2, e3 and e4. What makes it the case that, say, e1 and e2 are experiences had by one subject, A, while e3 and e4 are experiences had by another subject, B? One simple answer is that there is a relation that we could call ownership such that A bears ownership to both e1 and e2, and B bears ownership to both e3 and e4. However if, with Hume, we find the idea of the self problematic, we are bound to find the idea of ownership problematic. For what but the self could it be that owns the various experiences?

The second problem concerns diachronic unity. Consider four successive conscious experiences, e1, e2, e3 and e4, putatively had by one subject, A. What makes it the case that there is just one subject successively enjoying these experiences? That is, what makes the difference between a temporally extended stream of conscious experience and merely a succession of experiences lacking any experienced unity? An answer to this must provide a relation that somehow accounts for the experienced unity of conscious experience through time.

So, what is it for two experiences, e1 and e2, to belong to the same continuous stream of consciousness? One thought is that e1 and e2 must be united, or synthesised, by the self. On this view, the self must be aware of both e1 and e2 and must bring them together in one broader experience that encompasses them. If this is right then, without the self to unify my various experiences, there would be no continuous stream of conscious experience, just one experience after another lacking experiential unity. But our experience is evidently not like this. If the unity of consciousness requires the unifying power of the self, then Hume's denial of self-awareness, and any consequent doubts concerning the legitimacy of the idea of the self, are deeply problematic.

b. Kant and the Transcendental I

Kant's view of these matters is complex. However, at one level, he can be seen to agree with Hume on the question of self-awareness while disagreeing with him concerning the legitimacy of the concept of the self. His solution to the two problems of the unity of concious is, as above, that diverse experiences are unified by me. He writes:

The thought that these representations given in intuition all together belong to me means, accordingly, the same as that I unite them in a self-consciousness, or at least can unite them therein…for otherwise I would have as multicoloured, diverse a self as I have representations of which I am conscious.
(Kant 1929, sec. B143)

Thus, Kant requires that the notion of the self as unifier of experience be legitimate. Nevertheless, he denies that reflection reveals this self to direct intuition:

...this identity of the subject, of which I can be conscious in all my representations, does not concern any intuition of the subject, whereby it is given as an object, and cannot therefore signify the identity of the person, if by that is understood the consciousness of the identity of one's own substance, as a thinking being, in all change of its states.
(Kant 1929, sec. B408)

The reason that Kant can allow the self as a legitimate concept despite the lack of an intuitive awareness of the self is that he does not accept the empiricism that drove Hume's account. On the Kantian view, it is legitimate to appeal to an I that unifies experience since such a thing is precisely a condition of the possibility of experience. Without such a unifying self, experience would not be possible, therefore the concept is legitimate. The I, on this account, is transcendental—it is brought into the account as a condition of the possibility of experience (this move is one of the distinctive features of Kantian transcendental philosophy).

c. Husserl and the Transcendental Ego

Husserl's views on the self evolved over his philosophical career. In Logical Investigations, he accepted something like the Humean view (Husserl 2001, 91-3), and did not appear to find overly problematic the resulting questions concerning the unity of consciousness. However, by the time of Ideas I, he had altered his view. There he wrote that, "all mental processes…as belonging to the one stream of mental processes which is mine, must admit of becoming converted into actional cogitationes…In Kant's words, 'The 'I think' must be capable to accompanying all my presentations.'" (Husserl 1982, sec. 57). Thus, Husserl offers an account of unity that appeals to the self functioning transcendentally, as a condition of the possibility of experience.

However, Husserl departs from Kant, and before him Hume, in claiming that this self is experienced in direct intuition. He claims that, "I exist for myself and am constantly given to myself, by experiential evidence, as 'I myself.' This is true of the transcendental ego and, correspondingly, of the psychologically pure ego; it is true, moreover, with respect to any sense of the word ego." (Husserl 1960, sec. 33).

On Kant's view, the I is purely formal, playing a role in structuring experience but not itself given in experience. On Husserl's view, the I plays this structuring role, but is also given in inner experience. The ego appears but not as (part of) a mental process. It's presence is continual and unchanging. Husserl says that it is, "a transcendency within immanency" (Husserl 1982, sec. 57). It is immanent in that it is on the subject side of experience; It is transcendent in that it is not an experience (or part of one). What Husserl has in mind here is somewhat unclear, but one might liken it to the way that the object as a whole is given through an aspect—except that the ego is at "the other end" of intentional experience.

d. Sartre and the Transcendent Ego

Sartre's view that consciousness is empty involves the denial not only of sensory qualities but also of the view that we are experientially aware of an ego within consciousness. Sartre denies that the ego is given in pre-reflective experience, either in the content of experience (as an object) or as a structural feature of the experience itself (as a subject). As he puts it, "while I was reading, there was consciousness of the book, of the heroes of the novel, but the I was not inhabiting this consciousness. It was only consciousness of the object and non-positional consciousness of itself" (Sartre 1960, 46-7). Again, "When I run after a streetcar, when I look at the time, when I am absorbed in contemplating a portrait, there is no I." (Sartre 1960, 48-9).

Here Sartre appears to be siding with Hume and Kant on the question of the givenness of the self with respect to everyday, pre-reflective consciousness. However, Sartre departs from the Humean view, in that he allows that the ego is given in reflective consciousness:

...the I never appears except on the occasion of a reflexive act. In this case, the complex structure of consciousness is as follows: there is an unreflected act of reflection, without an I, which is directed on a reflected consciousness. The latter becomes the object of the reflecting consciousness without ceasing to affirm its own object (a chair, a mathematical truth, etc.). At the same time, a new object appears which is the occasion of an affirmation by reflective consciousness…This transcendent object of the reflective act is the I.
(Sartre 1960, 53)

On this view, the self can appear to consciousness, but it is paradoxically experienced as something outside of, transcendent to, consciousness. Hence the transcendence of the ego, Sartre's title.

With respect to unreflective consciousness, however, Sartre denies self-awareness. Sartre also denies that the ego is required to synthesise, or unite, one's various experiences. Rather, as he sees it, the unity of consciousness is achieved via the objects of experience, and via the temporal structure of experience. Although his explanation is somewhat sketchy, his intent is clear: is certain that phenomenology does not need to appeal to any such unifying and individualizing I…The object is transcendent to the consciousness which grasps it, and it is in the object that the unity of the consciousness is found…It is consciousness which unifies itself, concretely, by a play of "transversal" intentionalities which are concrete and real retentions of past consciousnesses. Thus consciousness refers perpetually to itself.
(Sartre 1960, 38-9)

6. Phenomenology of Time-Consciousness

Various questions have occupied phenomenologists concerning time-consciousness—how our conscious lives take place over time. What exactly does this amount to? This question can be seen as asking for more detail concerning the synthesising activity of the self with respect to the diachronic unity of consciousness. Related to this, temporal objects (such as melodies or events) have temporal parts or phases. How is it that the temporal parts of a melody are experienced as parts of one and the same thing? How is it that we have an experience of succession, rather than simply a succession of experiences? This seems an especially hard question to answer if we endorse the claim that we can only be experientially aware of the present instant. For if, at time t1 we enjoy experience e1 of object (or event) o1, and at t2 we enjoy experience e2 of object (or event) o2, then it seems that we are always experientially confined to the present. An account is needed of how is it that our experience appears to stream through time.

a. The Specious Present

When faced with this problem, a popular view has been that we are simultaneously aware of more than an instant. According to William James, "the practically cognized present is no knife-edge, but a saddle-back, with a certain breadth of its own on which we sit perched, and from which we look in two directions into time. The unit of composition of our perception of time is a duration" (James 1981, 609).The doctrine of the specious present holds that we are experientially aware of a span of time that includes the present and past (and perhaps even the future). So, at t2 we are aware of the events that occur at both t2 and t1 (and perhaps also t3).

The specious present is present in the sense that the phases of the temporal object are experienced as present. The specious present is specious in that those phases of the temporal object that occur at times other than the present instant are not really present. But this would seem to have the bizarre consequence that we experience the successive phases of a temporal object as simultaneous. That is, a moving object is simultaneously experienced as being at more than one place. It goes without saying that this is not phenomenologically accurate.

Also, given that our experience at each instant would span a duration longer than that instant, it seems that we would experience everything more than once. In a sequence of notes c, d, e we would experience c at the time at which c occurs, and then again at the time at which d occurs. But, of course, we only experience each note once.

b. Primal Impression, Retention and Protention

Husserl's position is not entirely unlike the specious present view. He maintains that, at any one instant, one has experience of the phase occurring at that instant, the phase(s) that has just occurred, and that phase that is just about to occur. His labels for these three aspects of experience are "primal impression," "retention" and "protention."  All three must be in place for the proper experience of a temporal object, or of the duration of a non-temporal object.

The primal impression is an intentional awareness of the present event as present. Retention is an intentional awareness of the past event as past. Protention is an intentional awareness of the future event as about to happen. Each is an intentional directedness towards a present, past and future event respectively. As Husserl puts matters, "In each primal phase that originally constitutes the immanent content we have retentions of the preceding phases and protentions of the coming phases of precisely this content" (Husserl 1991, sec. 40). The movement from something's being protended, to its being experienced as a primal impression, to its being retained, is what accounts for the continuous stream of experience. Retention and protention form the temporal horizon against which the present phase is perceived. That is, the present is perceived as that which follows a past present and anticipates a future present.

c. Absolute Consciousness

Not only does the present experience include a retention of past worldly events, it also includes a retention of the past experiences of those past events. The same can be said with regard to protention. The fact that past and future experiences are retained and protended respectively, points towards this question: What accounts for the fact that mental acts themselves are experienced as enduring, or as having temporal parts? Do we need to postulate a second level of conscious acts (call it "consciousness*") that explains the experienced temporality of immanent objects? But this suggestion looks as though it would involve us in an infinite regress, since the temporality of the stream of experiences constituting consciousness* would need to be accounted for.

Husserl's proposed solution to this puzzle involves his late notion of "absolute constituting consciousness." The temporality of experiences is constituted by a consciousness that is not itself temporal. He writes: "Subjective time becomes constituted in the absolute timeless consciousness, which is not an object" (Husserl 1991, 117). Further, "The flow of modes of consciousness is not a process; the consciousness of the now is not itself now…therefore sensation…and likewise retention, recollection, perception, etc. are nontemporal; that is to say, nothing in immanent time." (Husserl 1991, 345-6).

The interpretation of Husserl's notion of absolute constituting consciousness is not helped by the fact that, despite the non-temporal nature of absolute consciousness, Husserl describes it in temporal terms, such as "flow." Indeed, Husserl seems to have thought that here we have come up against a phenomenon intrinsically problematic to describe:

Now if we consider the constituting appearances of the consciousness of internal time we find the following: they form a flow…. But is not the flow a succession? Does it not have a now, an actually present phase, and a continuity of pasts which I am now conscious in retentions? We have no alternative here but to say: the flow is something we speak of in conformity with what is constituted, but it is not "something in objective time." It…has the absolute properties of something to be designated metaphorically as "flow"…. For all of this we have no names. (Husserl 1991, 381-2)

7. Conclusion

Husserlian and post-Husserlian phenomenology stands in complex relations to a number of different philosophical traditions, most notably British empiricism, Kantian and post-Kantian transcendental philosophy, and French existentialism. One of the most important philosophical movements of the Twentieth Century, phenomenology has been influential, not only on so-called "Continental" philosophy (Embree 2003), but also on so-called "analytic" philosophy (Smith and Thomasson 2005). There continues to be a great deal of interest in the history of phenomenology and in the topics discussed by Twentieth Century phenomenologists, topics such as intentionality, perception, the self and time-consciousness.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ayer, A. J. 1946. Phenomenalism. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 47: 163-96
  • Bernet, Rudolf, Iso Kern, and Eduard Marbach. 1993. An Introduction to Husserlian Phenomenology. Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press.
  • Brentano, Franz. 1995. Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint. Ed. Oskar Kraus. Trans. Antos C. Rancurello, D. B. Terrell, and Linda L. McAlister. 2nd ed. London: Routledge.
  • Carman, Taylor. 2006. The Principle of Phenomenology. In The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger, ed. Charles, B. Guignon. 2nd ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Carman, Taylor. 2008. Merleau-Ponty. London: Routledge.
  • Cerbone, David R. 2006. Understanding Phenomenology. Chesham: Acumen.
  • Crane, T. 2006. Brentano's Concept of Intentional Inexistence. In The Austrian Contribution to Analytic Philosophy, ed. Mark Textor. London: Routledge.
  • Dreyfus, Hubert L. 1991. Being-in-the-World: A Commentary on Heidegger's Being and Time, Division I. Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press.
  • Embree, L. 2003. Husserl as Trunk of the American Continental Tree. International Journal of Philosophical Studies 11, no. 2: 177-190.
  • Frede, Dorothea. 2006. The Question of Being:Heidegger's Project. In The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger, trans. Charles, B. Guignon. 2nd ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gallagher, Shaun, and Dan Zahavi. 2008. The Phenomenological Mind: An Introduction to Philosophyof Mind and Cognitive Science. London: Routledge.
  • Gennaro, Rocco. 2002. Jean-Paul Sartre and the HOT Theory of Consciousness. Canadian Journal of Philosophy 32, no.3: 293-330.
  • Hammond, Michael, Jane Howarth, and Russell Keat. 1991. Understanding Phenomenology. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Heidegger, Martin. 1962 [1927]. Being and Time. Trans. John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Heidegger, Martin. 1982 [1927]. The Basic Problems of Phenomenology. Trans. Albert Hofstadter. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Hume, David. 1978 [1739-40]. A Treatise of Human Nature. Ed. L. A Selby-Bigge, rev. P. H. Nidditch. 2nd ed. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Husserl, Edmund. 1960 [1931]. Cartesian Meditations: An Introduction to Phenomenology. Trans. Dorion Cairns. The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Husserl, Edmund. 1973 [1939]. Experience and Judgement: Investigations in a Genealogy of Logic. Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Husserl, Edmund. 1977 [1925]. Phenomenological Psychology: Lectures, Summer Semester, 1925. Trans. John Scanlon. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Husserl, Edmund. 1982 [1913]. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy. Trans. F. Kersten. The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Husserl, Edmund. 1991 [1893-1917]. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917). Trans. John B Brough. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Husserl, Edmund. 1999 [1907]. The Idea of Phenomenology. Trans. Lee Hardy. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Husserl, Edmund. 2001 [1900/1901]. Logical Investigations. Ed. Dermot Moran. 2nd ed. 2 vols. London: Routledge.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1977. Perception: A Representative Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • James, William. 1981 [1890]. The Principles of Psychology. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Kant, Immanuel. 1929 [1781/1787]. Critique of Pure Reason. Trans. Norman Kemp Smith. London: Macmillan.
  • Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. 1989 [1945]. Phenomenology of Perception. Trans. Colin Smith. London: Routledge.
  • Moran, Dermot. 2000. Introduction to Phenomenology. London: Routledge.
  • Polt, Richard F. H. 1999. Heidegger: An Introduction. London: UCL Press.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul. 1972 [1936-7]. The Transcendence of the Ego: An Existentialist Theory of Consciousness. New York: Noonday.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul. 1989 [1943]. Being and Nothingness: An Essay on Phenomenological Ontology. Trans. Hazel E. Barnes. London: Routledge.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul. 1970 [1939]. Intentionality: A fundamental idea of Husserl's Phenomenology. Trans. J. P. Fell. Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology 1, no. 2.
  • Smith, David Woodruff. 2007. Husserl. London: Routledge.
  • Smith, David Woodruff, and Amie L Thomasson, eds. 2005. Phenomenology and Philosophy of Mind. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Sokolowski, Robert. 2000. Introduction to Phenomenology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wider, Kathleen. 1997. The Bodily Nature of Consciousness. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Zahavi, Dan. 2003. Husserl's Phenomenology. Stanford: Stanford University Press

Author Information

Joel Smith
University of Manchester
United Kingdom

Alexandre Kojève (1902—1968)

Alexandre Kojève was responsible for the serious introduction of Hegel into 20th Century French philosophy, influencing many leading French intellectuals who attended his seminar on The Phenomenology of Spirit in Paris in the 30s. He focused on Hegel’s philosophy of history and is best known for his theory of ‘the end of history’ and for initiating ‘existential Marxism.’ Kojève arrives at what is generally considered a truly original interpretation by reading Hegel through the twin lenses of Marx’s materialism and Heidegger’s temporalised ontology.

For Hegel, human history is the history of ‘thought’ as it attempts to understand itself and its relation to the world. He postulates that history began with unity, but into which man, a questioning ‘I’, emerges introducing dualism and splits. Man attempts to heal these sequences of ‘alienations’ dialectically, and drives history forwards, but in so doing causes new divisions which must then be overcome. Hegel sees the possibility of ‘historical reconciliation’ lying in the rational realization of underlying unity – the manifestation of an absolute spirit or ‘geist’ – leading to humanity living according to a unified, shared morality: the end of history.

Kojève takes these ideas of universal historical process and the reconciliation towards unity, and synthesizes them with theories of Marx and Heidegger. He takes Marx’s productivist philosophy that places the transformative activity of a desiring being centre-stage in the historical process, housing it within the conditions of material pursuit and ideological struggle. Drawing on Heidegger, he also defines this being as free, ‘negative’ and radically temporal, thereby recognizing and ‘reclaiming’ its mortality, ridding it of determinism and metaphysical illusion, allowing it to produce its own reality through experience alone.

This article examines the Hegelian context of Kojève’s work, and analyses how Marx and Heidegger contribute to his theory. It also outlines Kojeve’s vision of the culmination of history; how this fits into 20th Century politics; and the profound influence he had on French intellectuals including Sartre, Lacan and Breton, and on America intellectuals including Leo Strauss, Alan Bloom and Francis Fukuyama.

Table of Contents

  1. Chronology of Life and Works
  2. The Hegelian Context
  3. The Influence of Marx
  4. The Influence of Heidegger
  5. The End of History and the Last Man
  6. Kojève's Influence
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Chronology of Life and Works

French philosopher (1902-1968), born Aleksandr Vladimirovich Kozhevnikov in Russia. Kojève studied in Heidelberg, Germany where, under the supervision of Karl Jaspers, he completed a thesis (Die religöse Philosophie Wladimir Solowjews, 1931) on Vladimir Solovyov, a Russian religious philosopher deeply influenced by Hegel. He later settled in Paris, where he taught at the Ecole Pratique des Hautes Ētudes. Taking over from Alexandre Koyré, he taught a seminar on Hegel from 1933 till 1939. Along with Jean Hyppolite, he was responsible for the serious introduction of Hegel into French thought. His lectures exerted a profound influence (both direct and indirect) over many leading French philosophers and intellectuals - amongst them Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, Lacan, Bataille, Althusser, Queneau, Aron, and Breton. Via his friend Leo Strauss, Kojève's thought also exerted influence in America, most especially over Allan Bloom and, later, Francis Fukuyama. His lectures on Hegel were published in 1947 under the title Introduction à la lecture de Hegel, appearing in English as Introduction to the Reading of Hegel (1969). After the Second World War Kojève worked in the French Ministry of Economic Affairs, until his death in 1968. Here he exercised a profound, mandarin influence over French policy, including a role as one of the leading architects of the EEC and GATT. He continued to write philosophy over these years, including works on the pre-Socratics, Kant, the concept of right, the temporal dimensions of philosophical wisdom, the relationship between Christianity and both Western science and communism, and the development of capitalism. Many of these works were only published posthumously.

2. The Hegelian Context

Hegel's philosophy of history, most especially the historicist philosophy of consciousness developed in the Phenomenology of Spirit, provides the core of Kojève's own work. However, Kojève’s Hegel lectures are not so much an exegesis of Hegel's thought, as a profoundly original reinterpretation. By reading Hegel's philosophy of consciousness through the twin lenses of Marx's materialism and Heidegger’s temporalised ontology of human being (Dasein), Kojève can rightly be said to have initiated 'existential Marxism'. Here I will briefly sketch the most salient dimensions of Hegel's philosophy of history, before proceeding to outline Kojève's own interpretation of it.

Perhaps the core of Hegel's philosophy is the idea that human history is the history of thought as it attempts to understand itself and its relation to its world. History is the history of reason, as it grapples with its own nature and its relation to that with which it is confronted (other beings, nature, the eternal). The historical movement of this reason is one of a sequence of alienations (Entfremdungen) or splits, and the subsequent attempt to reconcile these divisions through a restoration of unity. Thus, for example, Hegel sees the world of the Athenian Greeks as one in which people lived in a harmonious relation to their community and the world about, the basis of this harmony being provided by a pre-reflective commitment to shared customs, conventions and habits of thought and action. With the beginnings of Socratic philosophy, however, division and separation is introduced into thought - customary answers to questions of truth, morality, and reality are brought under suspicion. A questioning 'I' emerges, one that experiences itself as distinct and apart from other beings, from customary rules, and from a natural world that becomes an 'object' for it. This introduces into experience a set of 'dualisms' - between subject and object, man and nature, desire and duty, the human and the divine, the individual and the collectivity. For Hegel, the historical movement of thought is a 'dialectical' process wherein these divisions are put through processes of reconciliation, producing in turn new divisions, which thought in turn attempts to reconcile. Historically, this task of reconciliation has been embodied in many forms - in art, in religion, and in philosophy. Enlightenment philosophy, the philosophy of Hegel's own time, is the latest and most sophisticated attempt to reconcile these divisions through reason alone, to freely find man's place amongst others and the universe as a whole. This, for Hegel, is only to be achieved through the overcoming (Aufhebung) of false divisions, by grasping that underlying apparent schisms (such as that between subject and object) there is a unity, with all elements being manifestations of an Absolute Spirit (Geist). Thus Hegel sees the key to historical reconciliation lying in the rational realisation of underlying unity, a unity that can, in time, come to connect individuals with each other and with the world in which they live. Universal history is the product of reason, leading (potentially) to a reconciled humanity, at one with itself, living according to a shared morality that is the outcome of rational reflection.

3. The Influence of Marx

Hegel's philosophy of universal history furnishes that basic framework of Kojève's philosophical stance. History is a processual movement in which division is subjected to reconciliation, culminating in 'the end of history', its completion in a universal society of mutual recognition and affirmation.

However, Kojève reworks Hegel in number of crucial (and, amongst Hegel scholars, controversial) ways. The first of these may be identified with the influence of Marx, especially the writings of the so-called '1848 manuscripts'. Kojève follows Marx's 'inverted Hegelianism’ by understanding the labor of historical development in broadly 'materialist' terms. The making of history is no longer simply a case of reason at work in the world, but of man's activity as a being who collectively produces his own being. This occurs through the labor of appropriating and transforming his material world in order to satisfy his own needs. Whereas Hegel's idealism gives priority to the forms of consciousness that produce the world as experienced, Kojève follows Marx in tying consciousness to the labor of material production and the satisfaction of human desires thereby. While Hegel recuperates human consciousness into a theological totality (Geist or 'Absolute Spirit'), Kojève secularises human history, seeing it as solely the product of man's self-production. Whereas Hegelian reconciliation is ultimately the reconciliation of man with God (totality or the Absolute), for Kojève the division of man from himself is transcended in humanist terms. If Hegel sees the end of history as the final moment of reconciliation with God or Spirit, Kojève (Like Feurbach and Marx) sees it as the transcendence of an illusion, in which God (man's alienated essence, Wesen) is reclaimed by man. Whereas the Hegelian totality provides a prior set of ontological relations between man and world waiting to be apprehended by a maturing consciousness, Kojève sees human action as the transformative process that produces those ontological relations. While Hegel arguably presents a 'panlogistic' relation between man and nature, unifying the two in the Absolute, Kojève sees a fundamental disjunction between the two domains, providing the conditions for human self-production through man's negating and transforming activities.

Perhaps the conceptual key to Kojève's understanding of universal history is desire. Desire functions as the engine of history - it is man's pursuit in realisation of his desires that drives the struggles between men. Desire is the permanent and universal feature of human existence, and when transformed into action it is the basis of all historical agency. The desire for 'recognition' (Anerkennung), the validation of human worth and the satisfaction of needs, propels the struggles and processes that make for historical progression. History moves through a series of determinate configurations, culminating in the end of history, a state in which a common and universal humanity is finally realised. This would entail 'the formation of a which the strictly particular, personal, individual value of each is recognised as such'. Hence individual values and needs would converge upon a common settlement in which a shared human nature (comprising the desires and inclinations that define humanity as such) would find its satisfaction.

How and why is this realisation of mutuality and equality to come about? Kojève follows Hegel's famous presentation of the 'master-slave’ dialectic in order to deduce the necessary overcoming of inequality, division and subordination. The relation of 'master' and ‘slave’ is one in which the satisfaction of a dominant group's or class’ needs (the 'masters’) is met through the subordination of others (the 'slaves' or ‘bondsmen’). The ‘slave’ exists only to affirm the superiority and humanity of the 'master', and to furnish the 'master's’ needs by surrendering up his labor. However, this relation is doomed to failure, for two fundamental reasons. Firstly, the 'master' desires the recognition and affirmation of his full humanity and value, and uses the subordinated 'slave' for that end. This means that the 'master', perversely, is dependent upon the ‘slave’, thus inverting the relation of domination. Moreover, this forced relation of recognition remains thoroughly incomplete, since the 'slave' is not in a position to grant affirmation freely, but is compelled to do so due to his subordination. Affirmation or recognition that is not freely given counts for nothing. As Kojève puts it:

The relation between Master and not recognition properly so-called...The Master is not the only one to consider himself Master. The Slave, also, considers him as such. Hence, he is recognized in his human reality and dignity. But this recognition is one-sided, for he does not recognize in turn the Slave's human reality and dignity. Hence, he is recognized by someone whom he does not recognize. And this is what is insufficient - what is tragic - in his situation...For he can be satisfied only by recognition from one whom he recognizes as worthy of recognizing him.

This establishes the constitutive need for mutual recognition and formal equality, if recognition of value is to be established. It is only when there is mutuality and recognition of all, that the recognition of any one becomes fully possible.

Secondly, for Kojève (as for Marx) it is the laboring 'slave' who is the key to historical progress. It is the ‘slave’ who works, and consequently it is he and not the 'master' who exercises his ‘negativity’ in transforming the world in line with human wants and desires. So, on the material level, the slave possesses the key to his own liberation, namely his active mastery of nature. Moreover, the 'master' has no desire to transform the world, whereas the 'slave', unsatisfied with his condition, imagines and attempts to realise a world of freedom in which his value will finally be recognised and his own desires satisfied. The slave's ideological struggle is to overcome his own fear of death and take-up struggle against the 'master', demanding the recognition of his value and freedom. The coincidence of material and ideological conditions of liberation were already made manifest, for Kojève, by the revolutions of the 18th, 19th and 20th centuries; these struggles set the conditions for the completion of history in the form of universal society.

4. The Influence of Heidegger

If Marx furnishes one central resource for Kojève's rereading of Hegel, Heidegger provides the other. From Heidegger, Kojève takes the insight that humankind is distinguished from nature through its distinctive ontological self-relation. Man's being is conditioned by its radically temporal character, its understanding of its being in time, with finitude or death as its ultimate horizon. Kojève's ontology is, pace Heidegger’s analysis of Dasein in Being & Time, first and foremost experiential and existential. By bringing together Hegel with Heidegger, Kojève attempts to radically historicise existentialism, while simultaneously giving Hegelian historicity a radically existential twist, wherein man's existential freedom defines his being. Freedom is understood as the ontological relation of 'negativity', the incompleteness of human being, its constitutive ‘lack’. It is precisely because of this lack of a fully constituted being that man experiences (or, more properly is nothing other than) desire. The negativity of being, manifest as desire, makes possible man's self-making, the process of 'becoming'. This position can be see to draw inspiration from Heidegger's critique of the transcendental preoccupations of Western thought, which he claims set reified, metaphysically assured figurations of Being over and above the processes of Becoming (wherein the 'Being of Beings', das Sein des Seieinden, is variously revealed within the horizon of temporality). The disavowal of such metaphysically anchored and ultimately timeless configurations of human being frees man from determinism and 'throws' him into his existential freedom. In Kojève's thinking, man’s struggle is to exercise this freedom in order to produce a world in which his desires are satisfied, in the course of which he comes to accept his own freedom, ridding himself of the illusions of religion and superstition, 'heroically' claiming his own finitude or mortality.

We can see, then, how Kojève attempts to synthesise Hegel, Marx and Heidegger. From Hegel he takes the notion of a universal historical process within which reconciliation unfolds through an intersubjective dialectic, resulting in unity. From Marx he takes a secularised, de-theologised, and productivist philosophical anthropology, one that places the transformative activity of a desiring being centre stage in the historical process. From Heidegger, he takes the existentialist interpretation of human being as free, negative, and radically temporal. Pulling three together, he presents a vision of human history in which man grasps his freedom to produce himself and his world in pursuit of his desires, and in doing so drives history toward its end (understood both as culmination or exhaustion, and its goal or completion).

5. The End of History and the Last Man

Kojève's vision of the culmination of history has, in recent years, exercised a renewed influence, not least in light of the collapse of Soviet communism and its satellite states. If we examine the vision of completion that Kojève held-out, we can see precisely why the advocates (or apologists) of a post-Cold War global capitalist order have drawn such inspiration from Kojève's thesis.

For Kojève, historical reconciliation will culminate in the equal recognition of all individuals. This recognition will remove the rationale for war and struggle, and so will usher-in peace. In this way, history, politically speaking, culminates in a universal (global) order which is without classes or distinctions - in Hegelian terms, there are no longer any 'masters' and ‘slaves’, only free human beings who mutually recognise and affirm each others' freedom. This political moment takes the form of law, which confers universal recognition upon all individuals, thereby satisfying the particular individual's desire to be affirmed as an equal amongst others.

Simultaneously, the progression of man's productive capacities, his ability to take nature and transform it in order to satisfy his own needs and desires, will result in prosperity and freedom from such want. For Kojève, the economic culmination of human productive capacities finds its apotheosis not in communism, but in capitalism. Like Marx, Kojève believed that capitalism had unleashed productive forces, generating heretofore unimagined wealth. Moreover, like Marx he believed that the expansion of capitalism was an homogenising force, producing a globalising cultural standard that laid waste to local attachments, traditions and boundaries, replacing them with bourgeoisie values. Kojève departs from Marxism (and its variants such as Leninism) by rejecting the notion that capitalism contained inherent contradictions that would inevitably bring about its demise and supercession by communism. Marx thought that the immiseration of workers under 19th century capitalism would worsen as the pressure of market competition would lead to ever-more brutal extraction of surplus from workers' labor, in attempt to offset the falling rate of profit. This would result in the pauperisation of the proletariat, and capitalism's inability to avoid such crisis would necessitate the overthrow of its relations by a proletariat raised up to class consciousness under the conditions of its immiseration. Kojève, in contrast, believed that 20th century capitalism had found a way out of these contradictions, finding ways to yoke the market system to a redistributive arrangement that managed to spread the wealth it produced. Far from becoming increasingly impoverished, the working class was coming to enjoy unprecedented prosperity. This is why Kojève, as early as 1948, was proclaiming the United States as the economic model for the 'post-historical' world, the most efficient and successful in conquering nature in order to provide for human material needs. Hence he asserted, long before the final collapse of the Soviet empire, that the Cold War would end in the triumph of the capitalist West, achieved through economic rather than military means.

The end of history would also usher-in other distinctive forms. Philosophically, it would end in absolute knowledge displacing ideology. Artistically, the reconciled consciousness would express itself through abstract art - while pictorial and representational art captured cultural specifics, these specifics would have been effaced, leaving abstract aesthetic forms as the embodiment of universal and homogeneous consciousness.

However, Kojève's disposition to the culmination of universal history is radically ambivalent. On the one hand, he follows Marx by seeing in idyllic terms the post-historical world, one of universal freedom, emancipation from war and want, leaving space for "art, love, play, and so forth; in short, everything that makes Man happy". However, Kojève is simultaneously beset by pessimism. In his philosophical anthropology, man is defined by his negating activity, by his struggle to overcome himself and nature through struggle and contestation. This is the ontological definition of man, his raison d'etre. Yet the end of history marks the end of this struggle, thereby exhausting man of the activity which has defined his essence. The end of history ushers-in the 'death of man'; paradoxically, man is robbed of the definitional core of his existence precisely at the moment of his triumph. Post-historical man will no longer be 'man' as we understand him, but will be 'reanimalized', such that the end of history marks the ‘definitive annihilation of Man properly so-called'.

6. Kojève's Influence

The influence of Kojève's thought has been profound, both within France and beyond. It is possible to trace many connections within French philosophy that owe varying degrees of debt to Kojève, given that his distinctive reinterpretation of Hegel was key for the French reception of Hegel's thought. However, there are also a number of important philosophers for whom Kojève's Hegelianism provided direct insights that were taken-up and in-turn used to found distinctive philosophical positions.

Firstly, we must note the importance of Kojève's Hegelianism for Sartre's philosophical development. It is a matter of on-going contention whether or not Sartre personally attended the Hegel seminars of the 1930s. However, it can reasonably be claimed that Kojève's existential and Marxian reading of the Phenomenology was equally important as Heidegger's Being & Time for the position presented in Sartre's Being & Nothingness. Central to Sartre’s account is a thoroughly Kojèveian philosophical anthropology, one which finds man's essence in his freedom as pure negative activity, existentially separating the human for-itself (pour-soi) from the natural world of reified Being (en-soi). Sartre's account of the 'master-slave' dialectic follows Kojève’s in its existential reworking, albeit without the optimism that finds a possibility of reconciliation in this intersubjective struggle (for Sartre, the dialectic is doomed to repeat a struggle for domination in which each party attempts to claim its own freedom via the mortification of the other's Being). Moreover, Sartre's subsequent attempts to reconcile historical materialism with existentialism owe more than a passing debt to Kojève's original formulation of an 'existential Marxist' position.

Another eminent thinker for whom Kojève proved decisive was Jacques Lacan. Lacan's account of psycho-social formation was developed through a synthesis of Freud and structuralism, read through Kojève's ontologised version of the 'master-slave' dialectic. For Lacan, following Kojève, human subjectivity is defined first and foremost by desire. It is the experience of lack, the twin of the experience of desire, that provides the ontological condition of subject formation; it is only through the lack-desire dyad that a being comes into the awareness of its own separation from the world in which it is, at first, thoroughly immersed. Moreover, Lacan's account of the childhood development of self-consciousness, captured through his analysis of the 'mirror-stage', replays the intersubjective mediation of consciousness that Kojève presented to his French students (Lacan amongst them) in the Hegel lectures.

Kojève also profoundly influenced the likes of Georges Bataille and Raymond Queneau, both through the lectures they attended, and through the friendships he maintained with them for many years after. Queneau is often associated with Andre Breton and the surrealists (with whom he broke in 1929), but his novels present a vision of the world that is profoundly indebted to Kojève. Many of his most famous books depict life at the end of history; there is no more historical movement, progress or transformation to come, and his characters live in a kind of 'eternal present' attending to the activities of everyday enjoyment. History recurs as something that can only be enjoyed as a tourist attraction, or as a reverie of the past, viewed from the vantage point of its demise. Bataille (anthropologist, philosopher and pornographer, a doyen of recent postmodern aestheticism and anti-rationalism) was perhaps the most powerful articulator of Kojève's pessimism in the face of the 'death of man'. The victory of reason was, for Bataille, a curse; its inevitable triumph in the unstoppable march of modernity brought with it homogeneity, order, and disenchantment. The triumph of reason as history meant the twilight and death of man, as the excessive and destructive power of negativity was displaced by harmonious, reciprocal equilibrium. Bataille's response, a liberatory struggle against these forces through the evocation of perverse desires, madness, and anguish, takes Kojève's prognosis at its word, and stages a heroic resistance against the tide of historical forces.

The influence of Kojève outside France has probably been most pronounced in the United States. His ideas achieved a new salience and exposure with the publication of Francis Fukayama's The End of History and the Last Man (1992), in the wake of the Cold War. Fukayama was a student of Allan Bloom's, who in turn was a 'disciple' of the 'esoteric' émigré political philosopher Leo Strauss. It was Strauss who introduced a generation of his students to Kojève's thought, and in Bloom’s case, arranged for him to study with Kojève in Paris in the 1960s. The book, an international bestseller, presents nothing less than a triumphal vindication of Kojève's supposedly prescient thesis that history has found its end in the global triumph of capitalism and liberal democracy. With the final demise of Soviet Marxism, and the global hegemony of capitalism, we have finally reached the end of history. There are no more battles to be fought, no more experiments in social engineering to be attempted; the world has arrived at a homogenised state in which the combination of capitalism and liberal democracy will reign supreme, and all other cultural and ideological systems will be consigned irretrievably to the past. Fukayama follows Kojève in tying the triumph of capitalism to the satisfaction of material human needs. Moreover, he sees it as the primary mechanism for the provision of recognition and value. Consumerism and the commodity form, for Fukayama, present the means by which recognition is mediated. Humans desire to be valued by others, and the means of appropriating that valuation is the appropriation of the things that others themselves value; hence lifestyle and fashion become the mechanisms of mutual esteem in a post-historical world governed by the logic of capitalist individualism.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Butler, Judith: Subjects of Desire: Hegelian Reflections in Twentieth Century France. New York, Columbia University Press, 1999
  • Descombes, Vincent: Modern French Philosophy. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1980
  • Drury, Shadia B: Alexandre Kojève: The Roots of Postmodern Politics. Basingstoke, Macmillan, 1994
  • Fukuyama, Francis: The End of History and the Last Man. Harmondsworth, Penguin, 1992
  • Hegel, G.W.F: Phenomenology of Spirit. Oxford, Oxford University Press, 1977
  • Heidegger, Martin: Being and Time. Oxford, Blackwell, 1962
  • Kojève, Alexander: Introduction to the Reading of Hegel. New York, Basic Books, 1969
  • Kojève, Alexander: Kant. Paris, Gallimard, 1973
  • Kojève, Alexander: Le Concept, le Temps et le Discours. Paris, Gallimard, 1991
  • Kojève, Alexander: Outline of a Phenomenology of Right. London, Rowman & Littlefield, 2000
  • Lacan, Jacques: Ecrits: A Selection. London, Tavistock, 1977
  • Poster, Mark: Existential Marxism in Postwar France: From Sartre to Althusser. Princeton, Princeton University Press, 1975
  • Roth, Michael S: Knowing and History: Appropriations of Hegel in Twentieth Century France. Ithaca and London, Cornell University Press, 1988
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul: Being and Nothingness: An Essay on Phenomenological Ontology. London, Routledge , 1989

Author Information

Majid Yar
United Kingdom

Russian Philosophy

RussiaThis article provides a historical survey of Russian philosophers and thinkers. It emphasizes Russian epistemological concerns rather than ontological and ethical concerns, hopefully without neglecting or disparaging them. After all, much work in ethics, at least during the Soviet period, strictly supported the state, such that what is taken to be good is often that which helps secure the goals of Soviet society. Unlike most other major nations, political events in Russia's history played large roles in shaping its periods of philosophical development.

Various conceptions of Russian philosophy have led scholars to locate its start at different moments in history and with different individuals. However, few would dispute that there was a religious orientation to Russian thought prior to Peter the Great (around 1700) and that professional, secular philosophy—in which philosophical issues are considered on their own terms without explicit appeal to their utility—arose comparatively recently in the country's history.

Despite the difficulties, we can distinguish five major periods in Russian philosophy. In the first period (The Period of Philosophical Remarks), there is a clear emergence of something resembling what we would now characterize as philosophy. However, religious and political conservativism imposed many restrictions on the dissemination of philosophy during this time. The second period (The Philosophical Dark Age) was marked by much forced silence of the Russian philosophical community. Many subsumed philosophy under the scope of religion or politics, and the discipline was evaluated primarily by whether it was of any utility. The third period (The Emergence of Professional Philosophy) showed an increase in many major Russian thinkers, many of which were influenced by philosophers of the West, such as Plato, Kant, Spinoza, Hegel, and Husserl. The rise of Russian philosophy that was not beholden to religion and politics also began in this period. In the fourth period (The Soviet Era), there were significant concerns about the primacy of the natural sciences. This spawned, for example, the debate between those who thought all philosophical problems would be resolved by the natural sciences (the mechanists) and those who defended the existence of philosophy as a separate discipline (the Deborinists). The fifth period (The Post-Soviet Era) is surely too recent to fully describe. However, there has certainly been a rediscovery of the works of the religious philosophers that were strictly forbidden in the past.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview of the Problem
    1. Masaryk
    2. Lossky and Zenkovsky
    3. Shpet
    4. Concluding Remarks
  2. Historical Periods
    1. The Period of Philosophical Remarks (c.1755-1825)
    2. The Philosophical Dark Age (c. 1825-1860)
    3. The Emergence of Professional Philosophy (c. 1860-1917)
    4. The Soviet Era (1917-1991)
    5. The Post-Soviet Era (1991-)
  3. Concluding Remarks
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Overview of the Problem

The very notion of Russian philosophy poses a cultural-historical problem. No consensus exists on which works it encompasses and which authors made decisive contributions. To a large degree, a particular ideological conception of Russian philosophy, of what constitutes its essential traits, has driven the choice of inclusions. In turn, the various conceptions have led scholars to locate the start of Russian philosophy at different moments and with different individuals.

a. Masaryk

Among the first to deal with this issue was T. Masaryk (1850-1937), a student of Franz Brentano's and later the first president of the newly formed Czechoslovakia. Masaryk, following the lead of a pioneering Russian scholar E. Radlov (1854-1928), held that Russian thinkers have historically given short shrift to epistemological issues in favor of ethical and political discussions. For Masaryk, even those who were indebted to the ethical teachings of Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), scarcely understood and appreciated his epistemological criticism, which they viewed as essentially subjectivistic. True, Masaryk does comment that the Russian mind is "more inclined" to mythology than the Western European—a position that could lead us to conclude that he viewed the Russian mind as in some way innately different from others. However, he makes clear that the Russian predilection for unequivocal acceptance or total negation of a viewpoint stems, at least to a large degree, from the native Orthodox faith. Church teachings had "accustomed" the Russian mind to accept doctrinaire revelation without criticism. For this reason, Masaryk certainly placed the start of Russian philosophy no earlier than the 19th century with the historiosophical musings of P. Chaadaev (1794-1856), who not surprisingly also pinned blame for the country's position in world affairs on its Orthodox faith.

b. Lossky and Zenkovsky

Others, particularly ethnic Russians, alarmed by what they took to be Masaryk's implicit denigration of their intellectual character, have denied that Russian philosophy suffered from a veritable absence of epistemological inquiry. For N. Lossky (1870-1965), Russian philosophers admittedly have, as a rule, sought to relate their investigations, regardless of the specific concern, to ethical problems. This, together with a prevalent epistemological view that externality is knowable—and indeed through an immediate grasping or intuition—has given Russian philosophy a form distinct from much of modern Western philosophy. Nevertheless, the relatively late emergence of independent Russian philosophical thought was a result of the medieval "Tatar yoke" and of the subsequent cultural isolation of Russia until Peter the Great's opening to the West. Even then, Russian thought remained heavily indebted to developments in Germany until the emergence of 19th century Slavophilism with I. Kireyevsky (1806-56) and A. Khomiakov (1804-60).

Even more emphatically than Lossky, V. Zenkovsky (1881-1962) denied the absence of epistemological inquiry in Russian thought. In his eyes, Russian philosophy rejected the primacy accorded, at least since Kant, to the theory of knowledge over ethical and ontological issues. A widespread, though not unanimous, view among Russian philosophers, according to Zenkovsky, is ontologism (that is, that knowledge plays but a secondary role in human existential affairs). Yet, whereas many Russians historically have advocated such an ontologism, it is by no means unique to that nation. More characteristic of Russian philosophy, for Zenkovsky, is its anthropocentrism (that is, a concern with the human condition and humanity's ultimate fate). For this reason, philosophy in Russia has historically been expressed in terms noticeably different from those in the West. Furthermore, like Lossky, Zenkovsky saw the comparatively late development of Russian philosophy as a result of the country's isolation and subsequent infatuation with Western modes of thought until the 19th century. Thus, although Zenkovsky placed Kireyevsky only at the "threshold" of a mature, independent "Russian philosophy" (understood as a system), the former believed it possible to trace the first independent stirrings back to G. Skovoroda (1722-94), who, strictly speaking, was the first Russian philosopher.

Largely as a result of rejecting the primacy of epistemology and the Cartesian model of methodological inquiry, Lossky (and Zenkovsky even more) included within "Russian philosophy" figures whose views would hardly qualify for inclusion within contemporary Western treatises in the history of philosophy. During the Soviet period, Russian scholars appealed to the Marxist doctrine linking intellectual thought to the socio-economic base for their own rather broad notion of philosophy. Any attempt at confining their history to what passes for professionalism today in the West was simply dismissed as "bourgeois." In this way, such literary figures as Dostoyevsky and Tolstoy were routinely included in texts, though just as routinely condemned for their own supposedly bourgeois mentality. Western studies devoted to the history of Russian philosophy have largely since their emergence acquiesced in this acceptance of a broad understanding of philosophy. F. Copleston, for example, conceded that "for historical reasons" philosophy in Russia tended to be informed by a socio-political orientation. Such an apology for his book-length study can be seen as somewhat self-serving, since he recognizes that philosophy as a theoretical discipline never flourished in Russia. Likewise, A. Walicki fears viewing the history of Russian philosophy from the contemporary Western technical standpoint would result in an impoverished picture populated with wholly unoriginal authors. Obviously, one cannot write a history of some discipline if that discipline lacks content!

c. Shpet

Of those seemingly unafraid to admit the historical poverty of philosophical thought in Russia, Gustav Shpet (1879-1937) stands out not only for his vast historical erudition but also because of his own original philosophical contributions. Shpet, almost defiantly, characterized the intellectual life of Russia as rooted in an "elemental ignorance." Unlike Masaryk, however, Shpet did not view this dearth as stemming from Russia's Orthodox faith but from his country's linguistic isolation. The adopted language of the Bulgars lacked a cultural and intellectual tradition. Without a heritage by which to appreciate ideas, intellectual endeavors were valued for their utility alone. Although the government saw no practical benefit in it, the Church initially found philosophy useful as a weapon to safeguard its position. This toleration extended no further, and certainly the clerical authorities countenanced no divergence or independent creativity. With Peter the Great's governmental reforms, the state saw the utility of education and championed those and only those disciplines that served a bureaucratic and apologetic function. After the successful military campaign against Napoleon, many young Russian officers had their first experience of Western European culture and returned to Russia with incipient revolutionary ideas that, in a relatively short time, found expression in the abortive Decembrist Uprising of 1825. Finally, towards the end of the 1830s a new group, a "nihilistic intelligentsia," appeared that preached a toleration of cultural forms, including philosophy, but only insofar as they served the "people." Such was the fate of philosophy in Russia that it was virtually never viewed as anything but a tool or weapon and had to incessantly demonstrate this utility on fear of losing its legitimacy. Shpet concludes that philosophy as knowledge, as being of value for its own sake, was never given a chance.

d. Concluding Remarks

Regardless of the date from which we place the start of Russian philosophy and its first practitioner—and we will have more to say on this topic as we go—few would dispute the religious orientation of Russian thought prior to Peter the Great and that professional secular philosophy arose comparatively recently in the country's history. If we are to avoid a double standard, one for "Western" thought and another for Russian, which is not merely self-serving but also condescending, then we must examine the historical record for indisputable instances of philosophical thought that would be recognized as such regardless of where they originated. Although, on the whole, our inclusions, omissions, and evaluations may more closely resemble those of Shpet than, say, Lossky, we thereby need not invoke any metaphysical historical scheme to justify them.

How precisely to subdivide the history of Russian philosophy has also been a subject of some controversy. In his pioneering study from 1898, A. Vvedensky (see below), Russia's foremost neo-Kantian, found three periods up to his time. Of course, in light of 20th century events his list must be revisited, reexamined, and expanded. We can readily discern five periods in Russian philosophy, the last of which is still too recent to characterize. Unlike most major nations, specific extra-philosophical (namely, political) events clearly played a major role, if not the sole role, in terminating a period.

2. Historical Periods

a. The Period of Philosophical Remarks (c.1755-1825)

Although one can find scattered remarks of a philosophical nature in Russian writings before the mid-eighteenth century, these are at best of marginal interest to the professionally trained philosopher. For the most part, these remarks were not intended to stand as rational arguments in support of a position. Even in the ecclesiastic academies, the thin scholastic veneer of the accepted texts was merely a traditional schematic device, a relic from the time when the only appropriate texts available were Western. For whatever reason, only with the opening of the nation's first university in Moscow in 1755 do we see the emergence of something resembling philosophy, as we use that term today. Even then, however, the floodgates did not burst wide open. The first occupant of the chair of philosophy, N. Popovsky (1730-1760), was more suited to the teaching of poetry and rhetoric, to which chair he was shunted after one brief year.

Sensing the dearth of adequately trained native personnel, the government invited two Germans to the university, thus initiating a practice that would continue well into the next century. The story of the first ethnic Russian to hold the professorship in philosophy for any significant length of time is itself indicative of the precarious existence of philosophy in Russia for much of its history. Having already obtained a magister's degree in 1760 with a thesis entitled "Rassuzhdenie o bessmertii dushi chelovechoj" ("A Treatise on the Immortality of the Human Soul"), Dmitry Anichkov (1733-1788) submitted in 1769 a dissertation on natural religion. Anichkov's dissertation was found to contain atheistic opinions and was subjected to a lengthy 18-year investigation. Legend has it that the dissertation was publicly burned, although there is no firm evidence for this. As was common at the time, Anichkov used Wolffian philosophy manuals and during his first years taught in Latin.

Another notable figure at this time was S. Desnitsky (~1740-1789), who taught jurisprudence at Moscow University. Desnitsky attended university in Glasgow, where he studied under Adam Smith (1723-1790) and became familiar with the works of David Hume (1711-1776). The influence of Smith and British thought in general is evident in memoranda from February 1768 that Desnitsky wrote on government and public finance. Some of these ideas, in turn, appeared virtually verbatim in a portion of Catherine the Great's famous Nakaz, or Instruction, published in April of that year.

Also in 1768 appeared Ya. Kozelsky's Filosoficheskie predlozhenija (Philosophical Propositions), an unoriginal but noteworthy collection of numbered statements on a host of topics, not all of which were philosophical in a technical, narrow sense. By his own admission, the material dealing with "theoretical philosophy" was drawn from the Wolffians, primarily Baumeister, and that dealing with "moral philosophy" from the French Enlightenment thinkers, primarily Rousseau, Montesquieu, and Helvetius. The most interesting feature of the treatise is its acceptance of a social contract, of an eight-hour workday, the explicit rejection of great disparities of wealth and its silence on religion as a source of morality. Nevertheless, in his "theoretical philosophy," Kozelsky (1728-1795) rejected atomism and the Newtonian conception of the possibility of empty space.

During Catherine's reign, plans were made to establish several universities in addition to that in Moscow. Of course, nothing came of these. Moscow University itself had a difficult time attracting a sufficient number of students, most of whom came from poorer families. Undoubtedly, given the state of the Russian economy and society, the virtually ubiquitous attitude was that the study of philosophy was a sheer luxury with no utilitarian value. In terms of general education, the government evidently concluded that sending students abroad offered a better investment than spending large sums at home where the infrastructure needed much work and time to develop. Unfortunately, although there were some who returned to Russia and played a role in the intellectual life of the country, many more failed to complete their studies for a variety of reasons, including falling into debt. Progress, however, skipped a beat in 1796 when Catherine's son and successor, Paul, ordered the recall of all Russian students studying abroad.

Despite its relatively small number of educational institutions, Russia felt a need to invite foreign scholars to help staff these establishments. One of the scholars, J. Schaden (1731-1797), ran a private boarding school in Moscow in addition to teaching philosophy at the university. The most notorious incident from these early years, however, involves the German Ludwig Mellman, who in the 1790s introduced Kant's thought into Russia. Mellman's advocacy found little sympathy even among his colleagues at Moscow University, and in a report to the Tsar the public prosecutor charged Mellman with "mental illness." Not only was Mellman dismissed from his position, but he was forced to leave Russia as well.

Under the initiative of the new Tsar, Alexander I, two new universities were opened in 1804. With them, the need for adequately trained professors again arose. Once more the government turned to Germany, and, with the dislocations caused by the Napoleonic Wars, Russia stood in an excellent position to reap an intellectual harvest. Unfortunately, many of these invited scholars left little lasting impact on Russian thought. For example, one of the most outstanding, Johann Buhle (1763-1821), had already written a number of works on the history of philosophy before taking up residence in Moscow. Yet, once in Russia, his literary output plummeted, and his ignorance of the local language certainly did nothing to extend his influence.

Nonetheless, the sudden influx of German scholars, many of whom were intimately familiar with the latest philosophical developments, acted as an intellectual tonic on others. The arrival of the Swiss physicist Franz Bronner (1758-1850) at the new University of Kazan may have introduced Kant's epistemology to the young future mathematician Lobachevsky. The Serb physicist, A. Stoikovich (1773-1832), who taught at Kharkov University, prepared a text for class use in which the content was arranged in conformity with Kant's categories. One of the earliest Russian treatments of a philosophical topic, however, was A. Lubkin's two "Pis'ma o kriticheskoj filosofii" ("Letters on Critical Philosophy") from 1805. Lubkin (1770/1-1815), who at the time taught at the Petersburg Military Academy, criticized Kant's theory of space and time for its agnostic implications saying that we obtain our concepts of space and time from experience. Likewise, in 1807 a professor of mathematics at Kharkov University, T. Osipovsky (1765-1832), delivered a subsequently published speech "O prostranstve i vremeni" ("On Space and Time"), in which he questioned whether, given the various considerations, Kant's position was the only logical conclusion possible. Assuming the Leibnizian notion of a preestablished harmony, we can uphold all of Kant's specific observations concerning space and time without concluding that they exist solely within our cognitive faculty. Osipovsky went on to make a number of other perceptive criticisms of Kant's position, though Kant's German critics already voiced many of these during his lifetime.

In the realm of social and political philosophy, as understood today, the most interesting and arguably the most sophisticated document from the period of the Russian Enlightenment is A. Kunitsyn's Pravo estestvennoe (Natural Law). In his summary text consisting of 590 sections, Kunitsyn (1783-1840) clearly demonstrated the influence of Kant and Rousseau, holding that rational dictates concerning human conduct form moral imperatives, which we feel as obligations. Since each of us possesses reason, we must always be treated morally as ends, never as means toward an end. In subsequent paragraphs, Kunitsyn elaborated his conception of natural rights, including his belief that among these rights is freedom of thought and expression. His outspoken condemnation of serfdom, however, is not one that the Russian authorities could either have missed or passed over. Shortly after the text reached their attention, all attainable copies were confiscated, and Kunitsyn himself was dismissed from his teaching duties at St. Petersburg University in March 1821.

Another scholar associated with St. Petersburg University was Aleksandr I. Galich (1783-1848). Sent to Germany for further education, he there became acquainted with the work of Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775-1854). With his return to Russia in 1813, he was appointed adjunct professor of philosophy at the Pedagogical Institute in St. Petersburg; and in 1819, when the institute was transformed into a university, Galich was named to the chair of philosophy. His teaching career, however, was short-lived, for in 1821 Galich was charged with atheism and revolutionary sympathies. Although stripped of teaching duties, he continued to draw a full salary until 1837. Galich's importance lays not so much in his own quasi-Schellingian views as his pioneering treatments of the history of philosophy, aesthetics and philosophical anthropology. His two-volume Istorija filosofskikh sistem (History of Philosophical Systems) from 1818-19 concluded with an exposition of Schelling's position and contained quite probably the first discussion in Russian of G.W.F. Hegel (1770-1831) and, in particular, of his Science of Logic. Galich's Opyt nauki izjashchnogo (An Attempt at a Science of the Beautiful) from 1825 is certainly among the first Russian treatises in aesthetics. For Galich, the beautiful is the sensuous manifestation of truth and as such is a sub-discipline within philosophy. His 1834 work, Kartina cheloveka (A Picture of Man), marked the first Russian foray into philosophical anthropology. For Galich all "scientific" disciplines, including theology, are in need of an anthropological foundation; and, moreover, such a foundation must recognize the unity of the human aspects and functions, be they corporeal or spiritual.

The increasing religious and political conservativism that marked Tsar Alexander's later years imposed onerous restrictions on the dissemination of philosophy, both in the classroom and in print. By the time of the Tsar's death in 1825, most reputable professors of philosophy had already been administratively silenced or cowed into compliance. At the end of that year, the aborted coup known as the "Decembrist Uprising"—many of whose leaders had been exposed to the infection of Western European thought—only hardened the basically anti-intellectual attitude of the new Tsar Nicholas. Shortly after I. Davydov (1792/4-1863), hardly either an original or a gifted thinker, had given his introductory lecture "O vozmozhnosti filosofii kak nauki" ("On the Possibility of Philosophy as Science") in May 1826 as professor of philosophy at Moscow University, the chair was temporarily abolished and Davydov shifted to teaching mathematics.

b. The Philosophical Dark Age (c. 1825-1860)

The reign of Nicholas I (1825-1855) was marked by intellectual obscurantism and an enforced philosophical silence, unusual even by Russian standards. The Minister of Public Education, A. Shishkov, blamed the Decembrist Uprising explicitly on the contagion of foreign ideas. To prevent their spread, he and Nicholas's other advisors restricted the access of non-noble youths to higher education and had the tsar enact a comprehensive censorship law that held publishers legally responsible even after the official censor's approval of a manuscript. Yet the scope of this new "cast-iron statute" was conceived so broadly that even at the time it was remarked that the Lord's Prayer could be interpreted as revolutionary speech. While prevented an outlet in a dedicated professional manner at the universities, philosophy found energetic, though amateurish, expression first in the faculties of medicine and physics and then later in fashionable salons and social gatherings—where discipline, rigor and precision were held of little value. During these years, those empowered to teach philosophy at the universities struggled with the task of justifying the very existence of their discipline, not in terms of a search for truth, but as having some social utility. Given the prevailing climate of opinion, this proved to be a hard sell. The news of revolutions in Western Europe in 1848 was the last straw. All talk of reform and social change was simply ruled impermissible, and travel beyond the Empire's borders was forbidden. Finally, in 1850, the minister of education took the step that was thought too extreme in the 1820s: in order to protect Russia from the latest philosophical systems, and therefore intellectual infection, the teaching of philosophy in public universities was simply to be eliminated. Logic and psychology were permitted, but only in the safe hands of theology professors. This situation persisted until 1863, when, in the aftermath of the humiliating Crimean War, philosophy reentered the public academic arena. Even then, however, severe restrictions on its teaching persisted until 1889!

Nevertheless, despite the oppressive atmosphere, some independent philosophizing emerged during the Nicholas years. At first, Schelling's influence dominated abstract discussions, particularly those concerning the natural sciences and their place with regard to the other academic disciplines. However, the two chief Schellingians of the era—D. Vellansky (1774-1847) and M. Pavlov (1793-1840)—both valued German Romanticism, more for its sweeping conclusions than for either its arguments or its being the logical outcome of a philosophical development that had begun with Kant. Though both Vellansky and Pavlov penned a considerable number of works, none of them would find a place within today's philosophy curriculum. Slightly later, in the 1830s and '40s, the discussion turned to Hegel's system, again with great enthusiasm but with little understanding either with what Hegel actually meant or with the philosophical backdrop of his writings. Not surprisingly, Hegel's own self-described "voyage of discovery," the Phenomenology of Spirit, remained an unknown text. Suffice it to say that, but for the dearth of original competent investigations at this time, the mere mention of the Stankevich and the Petrashevsky circles, the Slavophiles and the Westernizers, etc. in a history of philosophy text would be regarded a travesty.

Nevertheless, amid the darkness of official obscurantism, there were a few brief glimmers of light. In his 1833 Vvedenie v nauku filosofii (Introduction to the Science of Philosophy), F. Sidonsky (1805-1873) treated philosophy as a rational discipline independent of theology. Although conterminous with theology, Sidonsky regarded philosophy as both a necessary and a natural searching of the human mind for answers that faith alone cannot adequately supply. By no means did he take this to mean that faith and reason conflict. Revelation provides the same truths, but the path taken, though dogmatic and therefore rationally unsatisfying, is considerably shorter. Much more could be said about Sidonsky's introductory text, but both it and its author were quickly consigned to the margins of history. Notwithstanding his book's desired recognition in some secular circles, Sidonsky soon after its publication was shifted first from philosophy to the teaching of French and then simply dismissed from the St. Petersburg Ecclesiastic Academy in 1835. This time it was the clerical authorities who found his book, it was said, insufficiently rigorous from the official religious standpoint. Sidonsky spent the next 30 years (until the re-introduction of philosophy in the universities) as a parish priest in the Russian capital.

Among those who most resolutely defended the autonomy of philosophy during this "Dark Age" were O. Novitsky (1806-1884) and I. Mikhnevich (1809-1885), both of whom taught for a period at the Kiev Ecclesiastic Academy. Although neither was a particularly outstanding thinker and left no enduring works on the perennial philosophical problems, both stand out for refusing simply to subsume philosophy to religion or politics. Novitsky in 1834 accepted the professorship in philosophy at the new Kiev University, where he taught until the government's abolition of philosophy, after which he worked as a censor. Mikhnevich, on the other hand, became an administrator.

One of the most interesting pieces of philosophical analysis from this time came from another Kiev scholar, S. Gogotsky (1813-1889). In his undergraduate thesis "Kriticheskij vzgljad na filosofiju Kanta" ("A Critical Look at Kant's Philosophy") from 1847, Gogotsky approached his topic from a moderate and informed Hegelianism, unlike that of his more vocal but dilettantish contemporaries. For Gogotsky, Kant's thought represented a distinct improvement over the positions of empiricism and rationalism. However, he demonstrated his own extremism through his advocacy of such ideas as that of the uncognizability of things in themselves, the rejection of the real existence of things in space and time, the sharp dichotomy between moral duty and happiness, and so on. During this "Dark Age," Gogotsky continued at Kiev University but taught pedagogy and remained silent on philosophical issues.

From our standpoint today, one of the most important characteristics of the philosophizing of the early "Kiev School" is the stress placed on the history of Western philosophy and particularly on epistemology. Mikhnevich, for example, wrote, "philosophy is the Science of consciousness... of the subject and the nature of our consciousness." Based on statements such as this, some (A.Vvedensky, A. Nikolsky) have seen the influence of Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814).

The teaching of philosophy at this time was not eliminated from the ecclesiastic academies; the separate institutions of higher education were parallel to the secular universities for those from a clerical background. Largely with good reason, the government felt secure about their political and intellectual passivity. Among the most noteworthy of the professors at an ecclesiastic academy during the Nicholaevan years was F. Golubinsky (1798-1854), who taught in Moscow. Generally recognized as the founder of the "Moscow School of Theistic Philosophy," his historical importance lies solely in his unabashed subordination of philosophy to theology and epistemology to ontology. For Golubinsky, humans seek knowledge in an attempt to recover an original diremption, a lost intimacy with the Infinite! Nevertheless, the idea of God is felt immediately within us. Owing to this immediacy, there is no need for and cannot be a proof of God's existence. Such was the tenor of "philosophical" thought in the religious institutions of the time.

At the very end of the "Dark Age" one figure—the Owl of Minerva (or was it a phoenix?)—emerged who combined the scholarly erudition of his Kiev predecessors with the dominating "ontologism" of the theistic apologists, such as Golubinsky. P. Jurkevich (1826-1874) stood with one foot in the Russian philosophical past and one in the future. Serving as the bridge between the eras, he largely defined the contours along which philosophical discussions would be shaped for the next two generations.

c. The Emergence of Professional Philosophy (c. 1860-1917)

While a professor of philosophy at the Kiev Ecclesiastic Academy, Jurkevich in 1861 caught the attention of a well-connected publisher with a long essay in the obscure house organ of the Academy attacking Chernyshevsky's materialism and anthropologism, which at the time were all the rage among Russia's youth. Having decided to re-introduce philosophy to the universities, the government, nevertheless, worried, lest a limited and controlled measure of independent thought get out of hand. The decision to appoint Jurkevich to the professorship at Moscow University, it was hoped, would serve the government's ends while yet combating fashionable radical trends.

In a spate of articles from his last three years in Kiev, Jurkevich forcefully argued in support of a number of seemingly disconnected theses but all of which demonstrated his own deep commitment to a Platonic idealism. His most familiar stance, his rejection of the popular materialism of the day, was directed not actually at metaphysical materialism but at a physicalist reductionism. Among the points Jurkevich made was that no physiological description could do justice to the revelations offered by introspective psychology and that the transformation of quantity into quality occurred not in the subject, as the materialists held, but in the interaction between the object and the subject. Jurkevich did not rule out the possibility that necessary forms conditioned this interaction, but, in keeping with the logic of this notion, he ruled out an uncognizable "thing in itself" conceived as an object without any possible subject.

Although Jurkevich already presented the scheme of his overall philosophical approach in his first article "Ideja" ("The Idea") from 1859, his last, "Razum po ucheniju Platona i opyt po ucheniju Kanta" ("Plato's Theory of Reason and Kant's Theory of Experience"), written in Moscow, is today his most readable work. In it, he concluded (as did Spinoza and Hegel before him) that epistemology cannot serve as first philosophy—that is, that a body of knowledge need not and, indeed, cannot begin by asking for the conditions of its own possibility; in Jurkevich's best-known expression: "In order to know it is unnecessary to have knowledge of knowledge itself." Kant, he held, conceived knowledge not in the traditional, Platonic sense, as knowledge of what truly is, but in a radically different sense as knowledge of the universally valid. Hence, for Kant, the goal of science was to secure useful information, whereas for Plato science secured truth.

Unfortunately, Jurkevich's style prevented a greater dissemination of his views. In his own day, his unfashionable views, cloaked as they were in scholastic language with frequent allusions to scripture, hardly endeared him to a young, secular audience. Jurkevich remained largely a figure of derision at the university. Today, it is these same qualities, together with his failure to elucidate his argument in distinctly rational terms, that make studying his writings both laborious and unsatisfying. In terms of immediate impact, he had only one student—V.Solovyov (see below). Yet, notwithstanding his meager direct impact, Jurkevic's Christian Platonism proved deeply influential until at least the Bolshevik Revolution of 1917.

Unlike Jurkevich, P. Lavrov (1823-1900), a teacher of mathematics at the Petersburg Military Academy, actively aspired to a university chair in philosophy (namely, the one in the capital when the position was restored in the early 1860s). However, the government apparently already suspected Lavrov of questionable allegiance and, despite a recommendation from a widely respected scholar (K. Kavelin), awarded the position instead to Sidonsky.

In a series of lengthy essays written when he had university aspirations, Lavrov developed a position, which he termed "anthropologism," that opposed metaphysical speculation, including the then-fashionable materialism of left-wing radicalism. Instead, he defended a simple epistemological phenomenalism that at many points bore a certain similarity to Kant's position, though without the latter's intricacies, nuances, and rigor. Essentially, Lavrov maintained that all claims regarding objects are translatable into statements about appearances or an aggregate of them. Additionally, he held that we have a collection of convictions concerning the external world, convictions whose basis lies in repeated experiential encounters with similar appearances. The indubitability of consciousness and our irresistible conviction in the reality of the external world are fundamental and irreducible. The error of both materialism and idealism, fundamentally, is the mistaken attempt to collapse one into the other. Since both are fundamental, the attempt to prove either is ill-conceived from the outset. Consistent with this skepticism, Lavrov argued that the study of "phenomena of consciousness," a "phenomenology of spirit," could be raised to a science only through introspection, a method he called "subjective." Likewise, the natural sciences, built on our firm belief in the external world, need little support from philosophy. To question the law of causality, for example, is, in effect, to undermine the scientific standpoint.

Parallel to the two principles of theoretical philosophy, Lavrov spoke of two principles underlying practical philosophy. The first is that the individual is consciously free in his worldly activity. Unlike for Kant, however, this principle is not a postulate but a phenomenal fact; it carries no theoretical implications. For Lavrov, the moral sphere is quite autonomous from the theoretical. The second principle is that of "ideal creation." Just as in the theoretical sphere we set ourselves against a real world, so in the practical sphere we set ourselves against ideals. Just as the real world is the source of knowledge, the world of our ideals serves as the motivation for action. In turning our own image of ourselves into an ideal, we create an ideal of personal dignity. Initially, the human individual conceives dignity along egoistic lines. In time, however, the individual's interaction, including competition, with others gives rise to his conception of them as having equal claims to dignity and to rights. In linking rights to human dignity, Lavrov thereby denied that animals have rights.

Of a similar intellectual bent, N. Mikhailovsky (1842-1904) was even more of a popular writer than Lavrov. Nevertheless, Mikhailovsky's importance in the history of Russian philosophy lies in his defense of the role of subjectivity in human studies. Unlike the natural sciences, the aim of which is the discovery of objective laws, the human sciences, according to Mikhailovsky, must take into account the epistemologically irreducible fact of conscious, goal-oriented activity. While not disclaiming the importance of objective laws, both Lavrov and Mikhailovsky held that social scientists must introduce a subjective, moral evaluation into their analyses. Unlike natural scientists, social scientists recognize the malleability of the laws under their investigation.

Comtean positivism, which for quite some years enjoyed considerable attention in 19th century Russia, found its most resolute and philosophically notable defender in V. Lesevich (1837-1905). Finding that it lacked a scientific grounding, Lesevich believed that positivism needed an inquiry into the principles that guide the attainment of knowledge. Such an inquiry must take for granted some body of knowledge without simply identifying itself with it. To the now-classic Hegelian charge that such a procedure amounted to not venturing into the water before learning how to swim, Lesevich replied that what was sought was not, so to speak, how to swim but, rather, the conditions that make swimming possible. In this vein, he consciously turned to the Kantian model while remaining highly critical of any talk of the a priori. In the end, Lesevich drew heavily upon psychology and empiricism for establishing the conditions of knowledge, thus leaving himself open to the charge of psychologism and relativism.

As the years passed, Lesevich moved from his early "critical realism," which abhorred metaphysical speculation, to an appreciation for the positivism of Richard Avenarius and Ernst Mach. However, this very abhorrence, which was decidedly unfashionable, as well as his political involvement somewhat limited his influence.

Undoubtedly, of the philosophical figures to emerge in the 1870s, indeed arguably in any decade, the greatest was Vladimir Solovyov (1853-1900). In fact, if we view philosophy not as an abstract, independent inquiry but as a more or less sustained intellectual conversation, then we can precisely date the start of Russian secular philosophy: 24 November 1874, the day of Solovyov's defense of his magister's dissertation, Krizis zapadnoj filosofii (The Crisis of Western Philosophy). For only from that day forward do we find a sustained discussion within Russia of philosophical issues considered on their own terms, that is, without overt appeal to their extra-philosophical ramifications, such as their religious or political implications.

After completion and defense of his magister's dissertation, Solovyov penned a highly metaphysical treatise entitled "Filosofskie nachala tsel'nogo znanija" ("Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge"), which he never completed. However, at approximately the same time, he also worked on what became his doctoral dissertation, Kritika otvlechennykh nachal (Critique of Abstract Principles)—the very title suggesting a Kantian influence. Although originally intended to consist of three parts, one each covering ethics, epistemology, and aesthetics, the completed work omitted the latter. For more than a decade, Solovyov remained silent on philosophical questions, preferring instead to concentrate on topical issues. When his interest was rekindled in the 1890s in preparing a second edition of his Kritika, a recognition of a fundamental shift in his views led him to recast their systemization in the form of an entirely new work, Opravdanie dobra (The Justification of the Good). Presumably, he intended to follow up his ethical investigations with respective treatises on epistemology and aesthetics. Unfortunately, Solovyov died having completed only three brief chapters of the "Theoretical Philosophy."

Solovyov's most relentless philosophical critic was B. Chicherin (1828-1904), certainly one of the most remarkable and versatile figures in Russian intellectual history. Despite his sharp differences with Solovyov, Chicherin himself accepted a modified Hegelian standpoint in metaphysics. Although viewing all of existence as rational, the rational process embodied in existence unfolds "dialectically." Chicherin, however, parted with the traditional triadic schematization of the Hegelian dialectic, arguing that the first moment consists of an initial unity of the one and the many. The second and third moments, paths, or steps are antithetical and take various forms in different spheres, such as matter and reason or universal and particular. The final moment is a fusion of the two into a higher unity.

In the social and ethical realm, Chicherin placed great emphasis on individual human freedom. Social and political laws should strive for moral neutrality, permitting the flowering of individual self-determination. In this way, he remained a staunch advocate of economic liberalism, seeing essentially no role for government intervention. The government itself had no right to use its powers either to aim at a moral ideal or to force its citizens to seek an ideal. On the other hand, the government should not use its powers to prevent the citizenry from the exercise of private morality. Despite receiving less treatment than the negative conception of freedom, Chicherin nevertheless upheld the idealist conception of positive freedom as the striving for moral perfection and, in this way, reaching the Absolute.

Another figure to emerge in the late 1870s and 1880s was the neo-Leibnizian A. Kozlov (1831- 1901), who taught at Kiev University and who called his highly developed metaphysical stance "panpsychism." As part of this stance, he, in contrast to Hume, argued for the substantial unity of the Self or I, which makes experience possible. This unity he held to be an obvious fact. Additionally, rejecting the independent existence of space and time, Kozlov held that they possessed being only in relation to thinking and sensing creatures. Like Augustine, however, Kozlov believed that God viewed time as a whole without our divisions into past, present, and future. To substantiate space and time, to attribute an objective existence to either, demands an answer to where and when to place them. Indeed, the very formulation of the problem presupposes a relation between a substantiated space or time and ourselves. Lastly, unlike Kant, Kozlov thought all judgments are analytic.

An unfortunately largely neglected figure to emerge in this period was M. Karinsky (1840- 1917), who taught philosophy at the St. Petersburg Ecclesiastic Academy. Unlike many of his contemporaries, Karinsky devoted much of his attention to logic and an analysis of arguments in Western philosophy, rather than metaphysical speculation. Unlike his contemporaries, Karinsky came to philosophy with an analytical bent rather than with a literary flair—a fact that made his writing style often decidedly torturous. True to those schooled in the Aristotleian tradition, Karinsky, like Brentano (to whom he has been compared) held that German Idealism was essentially irrationalist. Arguing against Kant, Karinsky believed that our inner states are not merely phenomenal, that the reflective self is not an appearance. Inner experience, unlike outer, yields no distinction between reality and appearance. In his general epistemology, Karinsky argued that knowledge was built on judgments, which were legitimate conclusions from premises. Knowledge, however, could be traced back to a set of ultimate unprovable, yet reliable, truths, which he called "self-evident." Karinsky argued for a pragmatic interpretation of realism, saying that something exists in another room unperceived by me means I would perceive it if I were to go into that room. Additionally, he accepted an analogical argument for the existence of other minds similar to that of John Stuart Mill and Bertrand Russell.

In his two-volume magnum opus Polozhitel'nye zadachi filosofii (The Positive Tasks of Philosophy), L. Lopatin (1855-1920), who taught at Moscow University, defended the possibility of metaphysical knowledge. He claimed that empirical knowledge is limited to appearances, whereas metaphysics yields knowledge of the true nature of things. Although Lopatin saw Hegel and Spinoza as the definitive expositors of rationalistic idealism, he rejected both for their very transformation of concrete relations into rational or logical ones. Nevertheless, Lopatin affirmed the role of reason particularly in philosophy in conscious opposition to, as he saw it, Solovyov's ultimate surrender to religion. In the first volume, he attacked materialism as itself a metaphysical doctrine that elevates matter to the status of an absolute that cannot explain the particular properties of individual things or the relation between things and consciousness. In his second volume, Lopatin distinguishes mechanical causality from "creative causality," according to which one phenomenon follows another, though with something new added to it. Despite his wealth of metaphysical speculation, quite foreign to most contemporary readers, Lopatin's observations on the self or ego derived from speculation that is not without some interest. Denying that the self has a purely empirical nature, Lopatin emphasized that the undeniable reality of time demonstrated the non-temporality of the self, for temporality could only be understood by that which is outside time. Since the self is extra-temporal, it cannot be destroyed, for that is an event in time. Likewise, in opposition to Solovyov, Lopatin held that the substantiality of the self is immediately evident in consciousness.

In the waning years of the 19th century, neo-Kantianism came to dominate German philosophy. Because of the increasing tendency to send young Russian graduate students to Germany for additional training, it should come as no surprise that that movement gained a foothold in Russia too. In one of the very few Russian works devoted to philosophy of science A. Vvedensky (1856-1925) presented, in his lengthy dissertation, a highly idealistic Kantian interpretation of the concept of matter as understood in the physics of his day. He tried therein to defend and update Kant's own work as exemplified in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Vvedensky's book, however, attracted little attention and exerted even less influence. Much more widely recognized were his own attempts in subsequent years, while teaching at St. Petersburg University, to recast Kant's transcendental idealism in, what he called, "logicism." Without drawing any conclusions based upon the nature of space and time, Vvedensky believed it possible to prove the impossibility of metaphysical knowledge and, as a corollary so to speak, that everything we know, including our own self, is merely an appearance, not a thing in itself. Vvedensky was also willing to cede that the time and the space in which we experience everything in the world are also phenomenal. Although metaphysical knowledge is impossible, metaphysical hypotheses, being likewise irrefutable, can be brought into a world-view based on faith. Particularly useful are those demanded by our moral tenets such as the existence of other minds.

The next two decades saw a blossoming of academic philosophy on a scale hardly imaginable just a short time earlier. Most fashionable Western philosophies of the time found adherents within the increasingly professional Russian scene. Even Friedrich Nietzsche's thought began to make inroads, particularly among certain segments of the artistic community and among the growing number of political radicals. Nonetheless, few, particularly during these formative years, adopted any Western system without significant qualifications. Even those who were most receptive to foreign ideas adapted them in line with traditional Russian concerns, interests, and attitudes. One of these traditional concerns was with Platonism in general. Some of Plato's dialogues appeared in a Masonic journal as early as 1777, and we can easily discern an interest in Plato's ideas as far back as the medieval period. Possibly the Catholic assimilation of Aristotelianism had something to do with the Russian Orthodox Church's emphasis on Plato. And again possibly this interest in Plato had something to do with the metaphysical and idealistic character of much classic Russian thought as against the decidedly more empirical character of many Western philosophies. We have already noted the Christian Platonism of Jurkevich, and his student Solovyov, who with his central concept of "vseedinstvo" ("total-unity") can, in turn, also be seen as a modern neo-Platonist.

In the immediate decades preceding the Bolshevik Revolution of 1917, a veritable legion of philosophers worked in Solovyov's wide shadow. Among the most prominent of these was S. Trubetskoi (1862-1905). The Platonic strain of his thought is evident in the very topics Trubetskoi chose for his magister's and doctoral theses: Metaphysics in Ancient Greece, 1890 and The History of the Doctrine of Logos, 1900, respectively. It is, however, in his programmatic essays "O prirode chelovecheskovo soznanija" ("The Nature of Human Consciousness"), 1889-1891 and "Osnovanija idealizma" ("The Foundations of Idealism"), 1896 that Trubetskoi elaborated his position with regard to modern philosophy. Holding that the basic problem of contemporary philosophy is whether human knowledge is of a personal nature, Trubetskoi maintained that modern Western philosophers relate personal knowledge to a personal consciousness. Herein lies their error. Human consciousness is not an individual consciousness, but, rather, an on-going universal process. Likewise, this process is a manifestation not of a personal mind but of a cosmic one. Personal consciousness, as he puts it, presupposes a collective consciousness, and the latter presupposes an absolute consciousness. Kant's great error was in conceiving the transcendental consciousness as subjective. In the second of the essays mentioned above, Trubetskoi claims that there are three means of knowing reality: empirically through the senses, rationally through thought, and directly through faith. For him, faith is what convinces us that there is an external world, a world independent of my subjective consciousness. It is faith that underlies our accepting the information provided by our sense organs as reliable. Moreover, it is faith that leads me to think there are in the world other beings with a mental organization and capacity similar to mine. However, Trubetskoi rejects equating his notion of faith with the passive "intellectual intuition" of Schelling and Solovyov. For Trubetskoi, faith is intimately connected with the will, which is the basis of my individuality. My discovery of the other is grounded in my desire to reach out beyond myself, that is, to love.

Although generally characterized as a neo-Leibnizian, N. Lossky (1870-1965) was also greatly influenced by a host of Russian thinkers including Solovyov and Kozlov. In addition to his own views, Lossky, having studied at Bern and Goettingen among other places, is remembered for his pioneering studies of contemporary German philosophy. He referred to Edmund Husserl's Logical Investigations already as early as 1906, and in 1911 he gave a course on Husserl's "intentionalism." Despite this early interest in strict epistemological problems, Lossky in general drew ever closer to the ontological concerns and positions of Russian Orthodoxy. He termed his epistemological views "intuitivism," believing that the cognitive subject apprehends the external world as it is in itself directly. Nevertheless, the object of cognition remains ontologically transcendent, while epistemologically immanent. This direct penetration into reality is possible, Lossky tells us, because all worldly entities are interconnected into an "organic whole." Additionally, all sensory properties of an object (for example, its color, texture, temperature, and so on) are actual properties of the object, our sense stimulation serving merely to direct our mental attention to those properties. That different people see one object in different ways is explained as a result of different ways individuals have of getting their attention directly towards one of the object's numerous properties. All entities, events, and relations that lack a temporal and spatial character possess "ideal being" and are the objects of "intellectual intuition." Yet, there is another, a third, realm of being that transcends the laws of logic (here we see the influence of Lossky's teacher, Vvedensky), which he calls "metalogical being" and is the object of mystical intuition.

Another kindred spirit was S. Frank (1877-1950), who in his early adult years was involved with Marxism and political activities. His magister's thesis Predmet znanija (The Object of Knowledge), 1915, is notable as much for its masterful handling of current Western philosophy as for its overall metaphysical position. Demonstrating a grasp not only of German neo-Kantianism, Frank drew freely from, among many others, Husserl, Henri-Louis Bergson, and Max Scheler; he may even have been the first in Russian to refer to Gottlob Frege, whose Foundations of Arithmetic Frank calls "one of the rare genuinely philosophical works by a mathematician." Frank contends that all logically determined objects are possible thanks to a metalogical unity, which is itself not subject to the laws of logic. Likewise, all logical knowledge is possible thanks solely to an "intuition," an "integral intuition," of this unity. Such intuition is possible because all of us are part of this unity or Absolute. In a subsequent book Nepostizhimoe (The Unknowable), 1939, Frank further elaborated his view stating that mystical experience reveals the supra-logical sphere in which we are immersed but which cannot be conceptually described. Although there is a great deal more to Frank's thought, we see that we are quickly leaving behind the secular, philosophical sphere for the religious, if not mystical.

No survey, however brief, of Russian thinkers under Solovyov's influence would be satisfactory without mention of the best known of these in the West, namely N. Berdjaev (1874-1948). Widely hailed as a Christian existentialist, he began his intellectual journey as a Marxist. However, by the time of his first publications he was attempting to unite a revolutionary political outlook with transcendental idealism, particularly a Kantian ethic. Within the next few years, Berdjaev's thought evolved quickly and decisively away from Marxism and away from critical idealism to an outright Orthodox Christian idealism. On the issue of free will versus determinism, Berdjaev moved from an initial acceptance of soft determinism to a resolute incompatibilist. Morality, he claimed, demanded his stand. Certainly, Berdjaev was among the first, if not the first, philosopher of his era to diminish the importance of epistemology in place of ontology. In time, however, he himself made clear that the pivot of his thought was not the concept of Being, as it would be for some others, and even less that of knowledge, but, rather, the concept of freedom. Acknowledging his debt to Kant, Berdjaev too saw science as providing knowledge of phenomenal reality but not of actuality, of things as they are in themselves. However applicable the categories of logic and physics may be to appearances, they are assuredly inapplicable to the noumenal world and, in particular, to God. In this way Berdjaev does not object to the neo-Kantianism of Vvedensky, for whom the objectification of the world is a result of functioning of the human cognitive apparatus, but only that it does not go far enough. There is another world or realm, namely one characterized by freedom.

Just as all of the above figures drew inspiration from Christian neo-Platonism, so too did they all feel the need to address the Kantian heritage. Lossky's dissertation Obosnovanie intuitivizma (The Foundations of Intuitivism), for example, is an extended engagement with Kant's epistemology, Lossky himself having prepared a Russian translation of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason comparable in style and adequacy to Norman Kemp Smith's famous rendering into English. Trubetskoi called Kant the "Copernicus of modern philosophy," who "discovered that there is an a priori precondition of all possible experience." Nevertheless, among the philosophers of this era, not all saw transcendental idealism as a springboard to religious and mystical thought. A student of Vvedensky's, I. Lapshin (1870-1952) in his dissertation, Zakony myshlenija i formy poznanija (The Laws of Thought and the Forms of Cognition), 1906, attempted to show that, contrary to Kant's stand, space and time were categories of cognition and that all thought, even logical, relies on a categorical synthesis. Consequently, the laws of logic are themselves synthetic, not analytic, as Kant had thought and are applicable only within the bounds of possible experience.

G. Chelpanov (1863-1936), who taught at Moscow University, was another with a broadly conceived Kantian stripe. Remembered as much, if not more so, for his work in experimental psychology as in philosophy, Chelpanov, unlike many others, wished to retain the concept of the thing-in-itself, seeing it as that which ultimately "evokes" a particular representation of an object. Without it, contended Chelpanov, we are left (as in Kant) without an explanation of why we perceive this, and not that, particular object. In much the same manner, we must appeal to some transcendent space in order to account for why we see an object in this spot and not another. For these reasons, Chelpanov called his position "critical realism" as opposed to the more usual construal of Kantianism as "transcendental idealism." In psychology, Chelpanov upheld the psychophysical parallelism of Wilhelm Wundt.

As the years of the First World War approached, a new generation of scholars came to the fore who returned to Russia from graduate work in Germany broadly sympathetic to one or even an amalgam of the schools of neo-Kantianism. Among these young scholars, the works of B. Kistjakovsky (1868-1920) and P. Novgorodtsev (1866-1924) stand out as arguably the most accessible today for their analytic approach to questions of social-science methodology.

During this period, Husserlian phenomenology was introduced into Russia from a number of sources, but its first and, in a sense, only major propagandist was G. Shpet (1879-1937), whom we have referred to earlier. In any case, besides his historical studies Shpet did pioneering work in hermeneutics as early as 1918. Additionally, in two memorable essays he respectively argued, along the lines of the early Husserl and the late Solovyov, against the Husserlian view of the transcendental ego and in the other traced the Husserlian notion of philosophy as a rigorous science back to Parmenides.

Regrettably, Shpet was permanently silenced during the Stalinist era, but A. Losev (1893-1988), whose early works fruitfully employed some early phenomenological techniques, survived and blossomed in its aftermath. Concentrating on ancient Greek thought, particularly aesthetics, his numerous publications have yet to be assimilated into world literature, although during later years his enormous contributions were recognized within his homeland and by others to whom they were linguistically accessible. It must be said, nonetheless, that Losev's personal pronouncements hark back to a neo-Platonism completely at odds with the modern temperament.

d. The Soviet Era (1917-1991)

The Bolshevik Revolution of 1917 ushered in a political regime with a set ideology that countenanced no intellectual competition. During the first few years of its existence, Bolshevik attention was directed towards consolidating political power, and the selection of university personnel in many cases was left an internal matter. In 1922, however, most explicitly non-Marxist philosophers who had not already fled were banished from the country. Many of them found employment, at least for a time, in the major cities of Europe and continued their personal intellectual agendas. None of them, however, during their lifetimes significantly influenced philosophical developments either in their homeland or in the West, and few, with the notable exception of Berdyaev, received wide recognition.

During the first decade of Bolshevik rule, the consuming philosophical question concerned the role of Marxism with regard to traditional academic disciplines, particularly those that had either emerged since Karl Marx's death or had seen recent breathtaking developments that had reshaped the field. The best known dispute occurred between the "mechanists" and the "dialecticians" or "Deborinists," after its principal advocate A. Deborin (1881-1963). Since a number of individuals composed both groups and the issues in dispute evolved over time, no simple statement of the respective stances can do complete justice to either. Nevertheless, the mechanists essentially held that philosophy as a separate discipline had no reason for being within the Soviet state. All philosophical problems could and would be resolved by the natural sciences. The hallowed dialectical method of Marxism was, in fact, just the scientific method. The Deborinists, on the other hand, defended the existence of philosophy as a separate discipline. Indeed, they viewed the natural sciences as built on a set of philosophical principles. Unlike the mechanists, they saw nature as fundamentally dialectical, which could not be reduced to simpler mechanical terms. Even human history and society proceeded dialectically in taking leaps that resulted in qualitatively different states. The specifics of the controversy, which raged until 1929, are of marginal philosophical importance now, but to some degree the basic issue of the relation of philosophy to the sciences, of the role of the former with regard to the latter, endures to this day. Regrettably, politics played as much of a role in the course of the dispute as abstract reasoning, and the outcome was a simple matter of a political fiat with the Deborinists gaining a temporary victory. Subsequent events over the next two decades, such as the defeat of the Deborinists, have nothing to do with philosophy. What philosophy did continue to be pursued during these years within Russia was kept a personal secret, any disclosure of which was at the expense of one's life. To a certain degree, the issue of the role of philosophy arose again in the 1950s when the philosophical implications of relativity theory became a disputed subject. Again, the issue arose of whether philosophy or science had priority. This time, however, with atomic weapons securely in hand there could be no doubt as to the ultimate victor with little need for political intervention.

Another controversy, though less vociferous, concerned psychological methodology and the very retention of such common terms as "consciousness," "psyche," and "attention." The introspective method, as we saw advocated by many of the idealistic philosophers, was seen by the new ideologues as subjective and unscientific in that it manifestly referred to private phenomena. I. Pavlov (1849-1936), already a star of Russian science at the time of the Revolution, was quickly seen as utilizing a method that subjected psychic activity to the objective methods of the natural sciences. The issue became, however, whether the use of objective methods would eliminate the need to invoke such traditional terms as "consciousness." The central figure here was V. Bekhterev (1857-1927), who believed that since all mental processes eventually manifested themselves in objectively observable behavior, subjective terminology was superfluous. Again, the discussion was silenced through political means once a victory was secured over the introspectionists. Bekhterev's behaviorism was itself found to be dangerously leftist.

As noted above, during the 1930s and '40s, independent philosophizing virtually ceased to exist, and what little was published is of no more than historical interest. Indicative of the condition of Russian thought at this time is the fact that when in 1946 the government decided to introduce logic into the curriculum of secondary schools the only suitable text available was a slim book by Chelpanov dating from before the Revolution. After Joseph Stalin's death, a relative relaxation or "thaw" in the harsh intellectual climate was permitted, of course within the strict bounds of the official state ideology. In addition to the re-surfacing of the old issue of the role of Marxism with respect to the natural sciences, Russian scholars sought a return to the traditional texts in hopes of understanding the original inspiration of the official philosophy. Some, such as the young A. Zinoviev (1922-2006) sought an understanding of "dialectical logic" in terms of the operations, procedures and techniques employed in political economics. Others, for example, V. Tugarinov, drew heavily on Hegel's example in attempting to delineate a system of fundamental categories.

After the formal recognition in the validity of formal logic, it received significant attention in the ensuing years by Zinoviev, D. Gorsky, and E. Voishvillo, among many others. Their works have deservedly received international attention and made no use of the official ideology. What sense, if any, to make of "dialectical logic" was another matter that could not remain politically neutral. Until the last days of the Soviet period, there was no consensus as to what it is or its relation to formal logic. One of the most resolute defenders of dialectical logic was E. Ilyenkov, who has received attention even in the West. In epistemology too, surface agreement, demonstrated through use of an official vocabulary obscured (but did not quite hide) differences of opinion concerning precisely how to construe the official stand. It certainly now appears that little of enduring worth in this field was published during the Soviet years. However, some philosophers who were active at that time produced works that only recently have been published. Perhaps the most striking example is M. Mamardashvili (1930-1990), who during his lifetime was noted for his deep interest in the history of philosophy and his anti-Hegelian stands.

Most work in ethics in the Soviet period took a crude apologetic form of service to the state. In essence, the good is that which promotes the stated goals of Soviet society. Against such a backdrop, Ja. Mil'ner-Irinin's study Etika ili printsy istinnoj chelovechnosti (Ethics or The Principles of a True Humanity) is all the more remarkable. Although only an excerpt appeared in print in the 1960s, the book-length manuscript, which as a whole was rejected for publication, was circulated and discussed. The author presented a normative system that he held to be universally valid and timeless. Harking back to the early days of German Idealism, Mil'ner-Irinin urged being true to one's conscience as a moral principle. However, he claimed he deduced his deontology from human social nature rather than from the idea of rationality (as in Kant).

After the accession of L. Brezhnev to the position of General Secretary and particularly after the events that curtailed the Prague Spring in 1968, all signs of independent philosophizing beat a speedy retreat. The government anxiously launched a campaign for ideological vigilance, which a German scholar, H. Dahm, termed an "ideological counter-reformation," that persisted until the "perestroika" of the Gorbachev years.

e. The Post-Soviet Era (1991-)

Clearly, the dissolution of the Soviet Union and the relegation of the Communist Party to the political opposition has also ushered in a new era in the history of Russian philosophy. What trends will emerge is still too early to tell. How Russian philosophers will eventually evaluate their own recent, as well as tsarist, past may turn to a large degree on the country's political and economic fortunes. Not surprisingly, the 1990s saw, in particular, a "re-discovery" of the previously forbidden works of the religious philosophers active just prior to or at the time of the Bolshevik Revolution. Whether Russian philosophers will continue along these lines or approach a style resembling Western "analytical" trends remains an open question.

3. Concluding Remarks

In the above historical survey we have emphasized Russian epistemological over ontological and ethical concerns, hopefully without neglecting or disparaging them. Admittedly, doing so may reflect a certain "Western bias." Nevertheless, such a survey, whatever its deficiencies, shows that questions regarding the possibility of knowledge have never been completely foreign to the Russian mind. This we can unequivocally state without dismissing Masaryk's position, for indeed during the immediate decades preceding the 1917 Revolution epistemology was not accorded special attention, let alone priority. Certainly at the time when Masaryk formulated his position, Russian philosophy was relatively young. Nonetheless, were the non-critical features of Russian philosophy, which Masaryk so correctly observed, a reflection of the Russian mind as such or were they a reflection of the era observed? If one were to view 19th century German philosophy from the rise of Hegelianism to the emergence of neo-Kantianism, would one not see it as shortchanging epistemology? Could it not be that our error lay in focussing on a single period in Russian history, albeit the philosophically most fruitful one? In any case, the mere existence of divergent opinions during the Soviet era—however cautiously these had to be expressed—on recurring fundamental questions testifies to the tenacity of philosophy on the human mind.

Rather than ask for the general characteristics of Russian philosophy, should we not ask why philosophy arose so late in Russia compared to other nations? Was Vvedensky correct that the country lacked suitable educational institutions until relatively recently, or was he writing as a university professor who saw no viable alternative to make a living? Could it be that Shpet was right in thinking that no one found any utilitarian value in philosophy except in modest service to theology, or was he merely expressing his own fears for the future of philosophy in an overtly ideological state? Did Masaryk have grounds for linking the late emergence of philosophy in Russia to the perceived anti-intellectualism of Orthodox theology, or was he simply speaking as a Unitarian. Finally, intriguing as this question may be, are we not in searching for an answer guilty of what some would label the mistake of reductionism, that is, of trying to resolve a philosophical problem by appeal to non-philosophical means?

4. References and Further Reading

Secondary works in Western languages:

  • Copleston, Frederick C. Philosophy in Russia, From Herzen to Lenin and Berdyaev, Notre Dame, 1986.
  • Dahm, Helmut. Der gescheiterte Ausbruch: Entideologisierung und ideologische Gegenreformation in Osteuropa (1960-1980), Baden-Baden, 1982.
  • DeGeorge, Richard T. Patterns of Soviet Thought, Ann Arbor, 1966.
  • Goerdt, W. Russische Philosophie: Zugaenge und Durchblicke, Freiburg/Muenchen, 1984.
  • Joravsky, David. Soviet Marxism and Natural Science 1917-1932, NY, 1960.
  • Koyre, Alexandre. La philosophie et le probleme national en Russie au debut du XIXe siecle, Paris, 1929.
  • Lossky, Nicholas O. History of Russian Philosophy, New York, 1972.
  • Masaryk, Thomas Garrigue. The Spirit of Russia, trans. Eden & Cedar Paul, NY, 1955.
  • Scanlan, James P. Marxism in the USSR, A Critical Survey of Current Soviet Thought, Ithaca, 1985
  • Walicki, Andrzej. A History of Russian Thought from the Enlightenment to Marxism, Stanford, 1979.
  • Zenkovsky, V. V. A History of Russian Philosophy, trans. George L. Kline, London, 1967.

Author Information

Thomas Nemeth
U. S. A.

Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness

Edmund Husserl, founder of the phenomenological movement, employs the term "phenomenology" in its etymological sense as the activity of giving an account (logos) of the way things appear (phainomenon). Hence, a phenomenology of time attempts to account for the way things appear to us as temporal or how we experience time. Phenomenology offers neither metaphysical speculation about time’s relation to motion (as does Aristotle), nor the psychological character of time’s past and future moments (as does Augustine), nor transcendental-cognitive presumptions about time as a mind-dependent construct (as does Kant). Rather, it investigates the essential structures of consciousness that make possible the unified perception of an object that occurs across successive moments. In its nuanced attempts to provide an account of the form of intentionality presupposed by all experience, the phenomenology of time-consciousness provides important contributions to philosophical issues such as perception, memory, expectation, imagination, habituation, self-awareness, and self-identity over time.Within the phenomenological movement, time-consciousness is central. The most fundamental and important of all phenomenological problems, time-consciousness pervades Husserl’s theories of constitution, evidence, objectivity and inter-subjectivity. Within continental philosophy broadly construed, the movements of existential phenomenology, hermeneutics, post-modernism and post-structuralism, as well as the work of Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Hans George Gadamer and Jacques Derrida, all return in important ways to Husserl’s theory of time-consciousness. After devoting considerable attention to Husserl’s reflections on time-consciousness, this article treats the developments of the phenomenological account of time in Heidegger, Sartre, and Merleau-Ponty.

Table of Contents

  1. Husserl, Phenomenology, and Time-consciousness
    1. Phenomenological Reduction and Time-Consciousness
    2. Phenomenology, Experienced Time and Temporal Objects
    3. Phenomenology Not to be Confused with Augustine’s Theory of Time
    4. Phenomenology and the Consciousness of Internal Time: Living-Present
    5. The Living-Present’s Double-Intentionality
  2. Heidegger on Phenomenology and Time
    1. Heidegger and Dasein’s Temporality
  3. Sartre and the Temporality of the “For-Itself”
  4. Merleau-Ponty and the Phenomenology of Ambiguity: The Subject as Time
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Husserl, Phenomenology, and Time-Consciousness

Phenomenology maintains that consciousness, in its very nature as activity, is intentional. In its care for and interest in the world, consciousness transcends itself and attends to the world by a myriad of intentional acts, e.g., perceiving, remembering, imagining, willing, judging, etc.—hence Husserl’s claim that intentional consciousness is correlated (that is, co-related) to the world. Although the notion of intentionality includes the practical connotations of willful interest, it fundamentally denotes the relation conscious has to objects in the world. Of these many modes of intentionality, time-consciousness arguably constitutes the central one for understanding consciousness’s intentional, transcending character. Put differently, time-consciousness underscores these other intentional acts because these other intentional acts presuppose or include the consciousness of internal time. For this and other reasons, Husserl, in his On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917) (1991), deemed time-consciousness the most “important and difficult of all phenomenological problems” (PCIT, No. 50, No. 39). Together with Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Syntheses (2001), Cartesian Meditations (1997) and Die ‘Bernaur Manuskripte’ über das Zeitbewußtseins 1917/18 (2001), this work seeks to account for this fundamental form of intentionality that the experience of temporal (e.g., spatial and auditory) and non-temporal (e.g., mathematical and logical) objects alike presupposes.

All experience entails a temporal horizon, according to phenomenology. This claim seems indisputable: we rush, we long, we endure, we plan, we reminisce, we perceive, we speak, we listen, etc. To highlight the difficulty and importance of explaining the structures of consciousness that make possible the experience of time, Husserl, like his contemporaries Henri Bergson and William James, favored the example of listening to a melody. For a melody to be a melody, it must have distinguishable though inseparable moments. And for consciousness to apprehend a melody, its structure must have features capable of respecting these features of temporal objects. Certainly, we can “time” the moments of a temporal object, a melody, with discrete seconds (measured by clocks). But this scientific and psychological account of time, which, following Newton, considers time as an empty container of discrete, atomistic nows, is not adequate to the task of explaining how consciousness experiences a temporal object. In this case of Newtonian time, each tone spreads its content out in a corresponding now but each now and thus each tone remains separated from every other. Newtonian time can explain the separation of moments in time but not the continuity of these moments. Since temporal objects, like a melody or a sentence, are characterized by and experienced as a unity across a succession, an account of the perception of a temporal object must explain how we synthesize a flowing object in such a way that we (i) preserve the position of each tone without (ii) eliminating the unity of the melody or (iii) relating each tone by collapsing the difference in the order between the tones.

Bergson, James and Husserl realized that if our consciousness were structured in such a way that each moment occurred in strict separation from every other (like planks of a picket fence), then we never could apprehend or perceive the unity of our experiences or enduring objects in time otherwise than as a convoluted patchwork. To avoid this quantitative view of time as a container, Husserl’s phenomenology attempts to articulate the conscious experience of lived-time as the prerequisite for the Newtonian, scientific notion of time’s reality as a march of discrete, atomistic moments measured by clocks and science. In this way, Husserl’s approach to time-consciousness shares much in common with these popular nineteenth Century treatments of time-consciousness. Yet to appreciate fully Husserl’s account of time-consciousness—the uniqueness of his contribution beyond other popular nineteenth Century accounts (deWarren 2008), and the priority he affords it in his own thinking—we first must understand phenomenology’s methodological device, the phenomenological reduction.

a. Phenomenological Reduction and Time-consciousness

Husserl believed that every experience for intentional conscious has a temporal character or background. We experience spatial objects, both successive (e.g., a passing automobile) and stationary (e.g., a house), as temporal. We do not, on the other hand, experience all temporal objects (e.g., an imagined sequence or spoken sentence) as spatial. For the phenomenologist, even non-temporal objects (e.g., geometrical postulates) presuppose time because we experience their timeless character over time; for example, it takes time for me to count from one to five although these numbers themselves remain timeless, and it takes some a long time to understand and appreciate the force of timeless geometrical postulates (PCIT § 45; see Brough 1991). To this point, common sense views of time may find Husserl agreeable. Such agreement ceases, however, for those who expect Husserl to proclaim that time resembles an indefinite series of nows (like seconds) passing from the future through the present into the past (as a river flows from the top of a mountain into a lake). This common sense conception of time understands the future as not-yet-now, the past as no-longer-now, and the present as what now-is, a thin, ephemeral slice of time. Such is the natural attitude’s view of time, the time of the world, of measurement, of clocks, calendars, science, management, calculation, cultural and anthropological history, etc. This common sense view is not the phenomenologist’s, who suspends all naïve presuppositions through the reduction.

Phenomenology’s fundamental methodological device, the “phenomenological reduction,” involves the philosopher’s bracketing of her natural belief about the world, much like in mathematics when we bracket questions about whether numbers are mind-independent objects. This natural belief Husserl terms the “natural attitude,” under which label he includes dogmatic scientific and philosophical beliefs, as well as uncritical, every-day, common sense assumptions. Not a denial of the external world, like Descartes methodologically proposed, the phenomenological reduction neutralizes these dimensions of the natural attitude towards experience in order to examine more closely experience and its objects just as they appear to conscious experience (Ideas I §§ 44-49; Sokolowski 2000). Put less technically, one could consider phenomenology a critical rather than habitual or dogmatic approach to understanding the world. To call phenomenology a critical enterprise means that it is an enterprise guided by the goal of faithfully describing what experience gives us—thus phenomenology’s famed return to the things themselves—rather than defaulting to what we with our dogmas and prejudices expect from experience—thus phenomenology’s famed self-description as a “pressupositionless science” (Logical Investigations)

That the phenomenologist suspends her natural attitude means that a phenomenology of time bypasses the inquiry into both natural time considered as a metaphysical entity and scientific world time considered as a quantitative construct available for observation and necessary for calculation (PCIT § 2). Without prejudice to the sciences, the reduction also suspends all philosophical presuppositions about time’s metaphysical, psychological or transcendental-cognitive nature. Hence, the phenomenological reduction enables Husserl to examine the structures of consciousness that allow us to apprehend and thus characterize the modes of temporal objects appearing as now, past or future. As Husserlians often express it, Husserl concerns himself not with the content of an object or event in time (e.g., listening to a sentence) but with how an object or event appears as temporal (Brough 1991).

As this discussion about the effect of the reduction on Husserl’s account of time implies, Husserl distinguishes three levels of time for our consideration: (3) world[ly] or objective time; (2) personalistic or subjective time; and (1) the consciousness of internal time. We can make assessments and measurements, e.g., declaring things simultaneous or enduring, at the level of objective time only because we experience a succession of mental states in our subjective conscious life. Our awareness of objective time thus depends upon our awareness of subjective time. We are aware of subjective time, however, as a unity across succession of mental states because the consciousness of internal time provides a consciousness of succession that makes possible the apprehension and unification of successive mental states (PCIT No. 40; Sokolowski 2000).

Husserl’s contention that all experience presupposes (1) at first appears as an exhaustively subjective denial of time’s reality, particularly in light of the reduction. Moreover, since we believe that natural time precedes and will outlast our existence, we tend to consider (3) more fundamental than (1). As such, some may find Husserl’s privileging of (1) counterintuitive (Sokolowski 2000). Of course, such a passively received attitude or belief about time and our place therein amounts to cultural prejudice in favor of the scientific view of human beings as mere physical entities subject to the relentless march of time. A brief example may help us better understand Husserl’s objective and thus dispel these reservations: When listening to a fifty minute lecture (level 3), one may experience it as slow or as fast (level 2). Still, each listener’s consciousness has a structure (level 1) that makes it possible for her to apprehend (3) and (2). This structure in (1) functions in such a way that each listener can agree about the objective duration of the lecture while disagreeing about their subjective experience of it. If (1) changed subjectively as (2), then we never could reach a consensus or objective agreement about (3). For the phenomenologist, who seeks to give an account (logos) of the way things appear as temporal, the manifest phenomenon of time is not fundamentally worldly/objective or psychological/subjective time (Brough, 1991). Concerned with how temporal phenomena manifest themselves to conscious perceivers, the phenomenologist examines (1), namely the structures of intentional consciousness that make possible the disclosure of time as a worldly or psychological phenomenon. To begin to explain the priority of (1), Husserl highlights how the now and past are not a part of time considered according to the natural attitude view of (3) or (2).

b. Phenomenology, Experienced Time and Temporal Objects

It should be clear already that Husserl does not privilege the Newtonian view of time as a series of now, past and future moments considered as “things,” containers for “things,” or points on the imagined “time-line” (PCIT §§ 1-2, No. 51). Conversely, he considers the present, past, and future as modes of appearing or modes by which we experience things and events as now, no longer (past) or not yet (future). For example, though I experience the event of the space shuttle Columbia’s explosion as past, the past is not some metaphysical container of which the Columbia shuttle tragedy is a part; the past is the mode in which the Columbia shuttle tragedy appears to me. This does not mean that Husserl views time as something that flows willy-nilly, or that the time of the Columbia shuttle tragedy is contemporaneous with the time of your reading this entry. Husserl acknowledges that “time is fixed and that time flows” (PCIT § 31, No. 51). When we count from one to ten, two always occurs after one and before three regardless of how far our counting progresses; likewise, the temporal event of the Columbia shuttle tragedy occupies an unchanging, determinate temporal position in world-time, “frozen” between what came before and after it, ever-receding into the past of world time (history) without losing its place. Phenomenology helps to clarify the common sense understanding of time as a container—a metaphysical placeholder—that contains events. This common sense understanding of time as a container persists because we forget that we first understand these fixed temporal relations and position thanks to the modes of appearing, namely now, past and future (Brough, 1991).

As Husserlians put it, Husserl considers the now as conscious life’s absolute point of orientation from which things appearing as past and future alter (PCIT §§ 7, 14, 31, 33). Since the now and past are not a part of time but the modes by which things appear to me as temporal, each now that becomes past can accommodate many events simultaneously, e.g., one may remember where one was when the shuttle exploded, what anchor man one might have heard, what channel one was watching, who one was with, etc. (PCIT § 33; Brough 2005). The very fact that this experience becomes part of one’s conscious life implies that one experienced it in the now. Moreover, I can remember what events preceded and succeeded this tragedy, e.g., that my grade-school class filed into the auditorium or that my teacher sniffled as she led us back to our classroom. The very fact that one can place the event in relation to preceding and succeeding events implies both that one never experiences the now in isolation from the past and future and that one experiences the relation between now, past and future without collapsing these three modes of appearing (PCIT § 31).

These reflections on temporal objects and experienced time indicate that the flow of our conscious life is the condition for the possibility of the disclosure of temporal objects and experienced time, a condition that begins from the privileged standpoint of the now, which, again, nevertheless occurs in an interplay with past and future rather than in isolation from them. More than this descriptive account of some essential features of time’s appearance, however, Husserl’s phenomenology of time-consciousness concerns itself with the structure of the act of perceiving that allows us to apprehend a temporal object as unified across its manifold moments. Indeed, our preliminary reflections on time depend upon a series of successive events but a succession of experiences or perceptions is not yet an experience or perception of succession. Husserl turns his attention toward (1)—the transcendental level of internal time-consciousness—in order to explain how (2) and (3) become constituted conscious experiences.

c. Phenomenology Not to be Confused with Augustine’s Theory of Time

When we say that Husserl focuses his attention on (2) and (1), we mean that his writings on time-consciousness attempt to explain how time and experienced time appear to consciousness. This explanation begins, for Husserl, by confronting the paradox of how to account for the unity of a process of change that continues for an extended period of time, a unity that develops in succession, e.g., listening to a sentence or watching a film (PCIT No. 50). To unravel this theoretical knot, Husserl believed, philosophy must realize that, beyond the temporality of the object, the act of perceiving has its own temporal character (PCIT No. 32). Consider the phrase, “Peter Piper picked a pack of pickled peppers” at the word, “picked.” In this example, I hear “picked” yet somehow must hold onto “Peter” and “Piper” in just the order in which I originally apprehended them. Husserl contends that insofar as a temporal object such as a sentence occurs across time in a now that includes what is no longer, consciousness too must extend beyond the now; indeed, if all I heard were different words in each new now without connecting them to past related words, then I never would hear a sentence but only a barrage of sounding words. Consciousness not only must extend beyond the now, but it also must extend in such a way that it preserves the determinate temporal order of the words and modifies their orientation to the now. Indeed, if I preserved the words in a simultaneous or haphazard order, then I never would hear a sentence but only a jumble of words.

To account for the unity of succession in a way that avoids these difficulties, Husserl will not explain consciousness’ extension beyond the now in an act of perception by merely importing a view of Newtonian time into the mind or translating such a view of natural time into a transcendental condition of the mind. This was Kant’s dogmatic failure in the “Transcendental Aesthetic” of his Critique of Pure Reason (Crisis 104 ff.). Nor will Husserl’s account of the “perception” of a temporal object conclude, as Augustine’s did, that consciousness extends beyond the now thanks to its “present of things no longer” and a “present of thing yet to come” that echoed Augustine’s description of the soul’s distention (PCIT § 1; Kelly 2005). Such an Augustinian account of “the present of thing no longer” cannot explain the perception of a temporal object because it traps the heard contents in the now (as a present of things no longer remains present nevertheless). Augustine’s notion of a “present of things no longer” can explain consciousness’ extension beyond the now only as a result of a memorial recollection. But memory drags past nows—and the contents occurring therein—back into the present, thereby rendering past moments simultaneous with a present moment and effectively halting time’s flow. Any account of temporal awareness that explains consciousness’’ extension beyond the now by recourse to memory conflates the acts of memory and perception and thus proves inadequate to explain the conscious perception of a temporal object. Memory gives not the perception of a temporal object but always only what it is capable of giving: a memory (PCIT No. 50; Brough, 1991).

With respect to this problem of conflating memory and perception, Husserl indicates two consequences. First, the distention of the now through memory leaves us with a situation where, as Husserl admits, at any given moment I perceive only the actually present word of the sentence; hence, the whole of the enduring sentence appears in an act that is predominantly memory and only marginally perception (PCIT § 12). Experience tells us, however, that we “perceive” (hear) the whole sentence across its present (now) and absent (past or future) words rather than hearing its present word and remembering (or expecting) the others (PCIT § 7). Indeed, something quite different occurs when I hear a sentence and when I remember the event of the Columbia shuttle tragedy. Second, having conflated the past and the present by making recourse to memory as a means to explain consciousness’ extension beyond the now, such a theory violates the law of non-contradiction, for the mode of the present cannot present something as past, but only as present, and vice versa (PCIT No. 14). In short, on such Augustinian theory, everything remains ‘now’ and nothing can overcome that fact (Brough 1993; Kelly 2005).

The problem of the consciousness of time becomes properly phenomenological when Husserl asks how one explains the original consciousness of the past upon which one can recognize an object as past rather remembering a past moment. Put differently, the problem of time becomes phenomenological when Husserl begins to seek an account of the generation of a sense or consciousness of pastness upon which (the) perception (of a temporal object) and memory depend. Indeed, to claim that we remember something presupposes the very sense of the past we are trying to explain (Sokolowski 2000). An adequate account of the perception of a temporal object first requires a discussion of how consciousness extends beyond the now, i.e., an account of the difference between the consciousness of succession and the remembrance of a succession of consciousnesses (PCIT No. 47; Brough 1972).

d. Phenomenology and the Consciousness of Internal Time: Living-Present

Unlike previous theories addressing the consciousness of time, Husserl shifts his attention from an account of what is perceived as temporal to an account of the temporality of that which does the perceiving. Put differently, he tightens his focus, so to speak, recognizing that when one perceives a temporal object one also experiences the flow of the intentional act of perception (Brough 1991). In order to solve the aforementioned paradox of how to account for the unity of a temporal object over the succession of its parts (e.g., the sentence across it many words), Husserl turns his attention to consciousness’ lived experience, to the structures of consciousness at level (1) that make possible the unification of the manifold moments of that act of perception at level (2) and the perceived object at level (3) (PCIT No. 41).

To explain how consciousness extends beyond the now in its act of perception, Husserl begins to think that consciousness itself must have a “width.” And this is just to say that consciousness must have a sense of the past and a sense of the future to begin with (Sokolowski 2000). To this end, Husserl attempts to argue that consciousness extends to capture past moments of experience and temporal objects therein by “retaining” and “protending” the elapsed and yet to come phases of its experience and thereby the past words that do not presently exist (when I reach a certain point in listening to a sentence) yet remain related to the present experience (PCIT, No. 54; Zahavi, 2000). Rather than attempt to explain the unity of a succession of discrete consciousnesses correlated with a succession of discrete moments in a temporal object, Husserl attempts to explain the consciousness of succession that makes possible the apprehension of a succession of consciousnesses.

Husserl thus speaks almost exclusively of consciousness’ living-present, and he characterizes this life of consciousness with three distinguishable yet inseparable moments: primal impression, retention, and protention. This tripartite form or intentional structure of the living-present should not be thought of as discrete, independently occurring pieces in a process (or procession). Such an atomistic view of the living-present’s structure will not work. Were the moments of the living-present thought as such, we would have to remember or re-present each past state of consciousness. Not a knife-edged moment, Husserl describes the life of consciousness, the living-present, as extended like a comets tail, or saddle-back, to use the image William James preferred, moments comprising an identity in a manifold (James) (PCIT § 10).

Consciousness is no longer a punctual box with several acts functioning in it simultaneously and directing themselves to the appropriate instances of the object. Admittedly, it is difficult to talk of this level of the consciousness of internal time, and Husserl himself claims we are reduced to metaphors (PCIT §§ 34-36). In a perhaps inadequate metaphor, Husserl’s theory of the living-present might be thought of as presenting a picture of consciousness as a “block” with relevant “compartments” distinguished by “filters” or “membranes,” each connected to and aware of the other. In this life of consciousness, Husserl maintains, consciousness apprehends itself and that which flows within it. As Husserl describes it, retention perceives the elapsed conscious phase of experience at level (1) and thereby the past of the experience at level (2) and the past of the object at level (3). The moments of retention and protention in the tripartite form of consciousness that is the living-present make possible consciousness’ extension beyond the now in such a way that avoids the problem of simultaneity and enables consciousness to attend determinately to the temporal phases of the object of perception. Unlike Augustine’s notion of a present of things no longer, which remembered or re-presented a past content in the now, Husserl draws a distinction between memory and retention. On the one hand, memory provides a “consciousness of the [instant] that has been” (PCIT § 12). On the other hand, retention “designates the intentional relation of phase of consciousness to phase of consciousness” (PCIT No. 50), i.e., a “consciousness of the past of the [experience]” (PCIT No. 47) and thereby the instant of the object that has been.

This distinction does not mean that memory differs from retention merely as a matter of temporal distance, the former reaching back further into time. Rather, Husserl draws a structural distinction between memory and retention: The former is an active, mediated, objectifying awareness of a past object, while the latter is a passive, immediate, non-objectifying, conscious awareness of the elapsed phase of conscious experience. First, memory reveals itself to be an act under the voluntary auspices of consciousness, whereas retention occurs passively. Second, while memories occur faster or slower and can be edited or reconstructed, retention occurs “automatically” and cannot be varied at one’s whim (though it can, at level 2, be experienced as faster or slower, as noted above in our example of listening to a lecture). Third, remembering re-produces a completed temporal object, whereas retention works at completing the consciousness of a temporal object, unifying its presence and absence. Fourth, as the representation of a new intentional object, memory is an act of presenting something as past, as absent, whereas the retention that attempts to account for the perception of an object over time constitutes an intuition of that which has just passed and is now in some sense absent, an act of presenting something as a unity in succession. Fifth, memory provides us with a new intentional object not now intuitively presented as the thing itself “in person”—e.g., remembering my friend’s face when she is absent from me in this moment—whereas retention accounts for the perception across time of an object now intuitively presented for me—e.g., the progressive clarity of my perception of my friends face as she approaches me from the street. Sixth, despite memory’s character as a presenting act, when it represents to me my friend’s face it represents it in the now with a change in temporal index or a qualification of the remembered object as past, whereas retention holds on to that which is related to my present perception in a mode of absences (e.g., as when I hear “picked” while retaining “Peter Piper”). Seventh, memory depends upon or is “founded” upon retention as the condition of its very possibility, for memory could never represent an object as a completed whole if retention did not first play its role in constituting across time the object now remembered (PCIT, No 50; Zahavi; Brough 1991.

To explain time-consciousness at level (1), then, Husserl comes to favor the theory that consciousness of the past and future must be explained by the intentional direction of retention and protention to the past and future of consciousness’ lived experience rather than a mode of memorial apprehension that issues from the now to animate past impressions. Returning to our above example of listening to a sentence, when I hear “picked,” I do not remember “Peter Piper.” Rather, I intuitively perceive the sentence as a temporally differentiated yet nonetheless related to the current [of this] experience. To be sure, the words do not occur simultaneously; each word passes and yet remains relevant to the presently lived experience. The interpreter of Husserl must take care at this point not to read the turn to consciousness as entailing a loss of the perceived; rather, what is retained is precisely the impressional moment as experienced in that moment and having been retained in this experience. In fact, this account allows that the words, “Peter Piper,” have passed, metaphysically, but remain on hand in this apprehension of “picked” thanks to consciousness’ retention of its past phase of experience wherein it heard the related words, “Peter Piper.” As a moment of the intentional relationship between the phases of consciousness’ living-present, retention “automatically” experiences its intuitively present conscious life and determinately provides a consciousness of the past of the experience.

Husserl’s account of the living-present ultimately articulates the condition for the possibility of all objectifying acts, a condition itself not objectified. As such, the discussion of retention brings us to the bottom line, the final and most difficult layer of intentional analysis, namely consciousness’ double-intentionality (PCIT No. 54).

e. The Living-Present’s Double-Intentionality

The living-present marks the essence of all manifestation, for in its automatic or passive self-givenness the living-present makes possible the apprehension of the elapsed phases of the life of consciousness and thereby the elapsed moments of the transcendent spatio-temporal object of which the conscious self is aware. This is possible, Husserl argues, because the “flow” (PCIT § 37) of conscious life enjoys two modes of simultaneously operative intentionality. One mode of intentionality, which he terms Langsintentionalität, or horizontal intentionality, runs along protention and retention in the flow of the living-present. The other mode of intentionality, which Husserl terms the Querintentionalität, or transverse intentionality, runs from the living-present to the object of which consciousness is aware (PCIT No. 45; Brough 1991).

Husserl explains the unity of these two intentional modes as a consciousness wherein the Querintentionalität is capable of intending a temporal object across its successive appearings because the Langsintentionalität provides consciousness’ self-awareness and awareness of its experiences over time. As an absolute flowing identity in a manifold—of primal impression, retention and protention—the stream of conscious life in the living-present constitutes the procession of words in the sentence that appears and is experienced sequentially in accordance with the temporally distinct position of each word. Husserl thus describes consciousness as having a “double-intentionality”: the Querintentionalität, which objectively and actively grasps the transcendent object—the heard sentence—and the Langsintentionalität, which non-objectively and automatically or passively grasps consciousness’ lived-experience—the flow of the living-present (PCIT No. 45). That I hear the words of the fifty-minute lecture and feel myself inspired or bored is possible only on the basis of my self-awareness or consciousness of internal time.

Though Husserl terms this consciousness that is the special form of horizontal intentionality in the living-present a “flow,” he employs the label “metaphorically” because the living-present’s flow manifests itself, paradoxically, as a non-temporal temporalizing (PCIT § 32, No. 54). That the living-present temporalizes means that it grasps its past and future as absent without reducing its past and future to the present, thus freezing consciousness temporal flow. To capture Husserl’s image of a non-temporal flow more aptly, some commentators prefer the image of shimmering (Sokolowski 1974). As Husserl himself admits that we have no words for this time-constituting phenomenon, the image of shimmering seems a more appropriate descriptor, for Husserl understand the living-present paradoxically as a standing-streaming (PCIT No. 54). Though non-temporal, Husserl assigns the living-present a time-constituting status, for this absolute consciousness makes possible the disclosure of temporal objects insofar as it makes possible the disclosure of consciousness’’ temporality by accounting for our original sense of the past and of the future in the retentional and protentional dimension of the living-present (PCIT § 37).

Husserl must characterize the flow as non-temporal. If that which makes possible the awareness of a unity in succession itself occurred in succession, then we would need to account for the apprehension of the succession unique to the living-present, and so on and so forth, ad infnitum (PCIT, No. 39, No. 50). An infinite regress of consciousness, however, would mean that we never would achieve an answer to the question of what makes possible the consciousness of time. In order to avoid an infinite regress, then, and in accordance with experience, which tells us that we do apprehend time and temporal objects, Husserl describes the living-present’s flow as a non-temporal temporalizing. This argument in favor of the non-temporal character of the living-present brings us to the two senses in which the special form of intentional consciousness is an absolute consciousness.

First, Husserl characterizes the living-present as absolute because a non-temporal consciousness that needs no other consciousness behind it to account for its self-apprehension is just that, absolute, the bottom line. Second, as the absolute bedrock of intentional analysis (Sokolowski 2000), the absolute flow as a mode of intentionality peculiar to the living-present conveys a move away from a model of awareness or intentionality dependent upon a subject’s relation to an object. If philosophy construes all awareness according to an object-intentionality model of awareness, i.e., the dyadic relation of a subject (knower) to an object (known), then it can never account for the relation between knower and known in the case of self-consciousness. For example, when I am writing this entry, I am conscious of the computer on which I am typing, as well as myself as the one typing. To explain, philosophically, however, how I apprehend myself as the one typing, the dyadic object-intentionality model of awareness will not suffice. The issue, of course, concerns self-awareness and thus philosophy’s standard understanding of self-identity over time.

In the classic treatment of self-consciousness, John Locke in his Essay Concerning Human Understanding accounts for self-identity over time thanks to consciousness’ reflective grasp on its past states. Locke establishes this account by distinguishing (i) simple ideas of sense directed toward (iia) objects from (i) simple ideas of reflection directed toward (iib) the self. In both cases, (i) knows (iia) and (iib) in the same manner insofar as (i) takes (iia) and (iib) as objects while (i) itself goes unnoticed or unaccounted for. Locke’s account thus turns the self or subject into an object without ever really presenting the self. Even if a simple idea of reflection directs itself toward the self, one self (the reflecting self) remains subject while the other self (the reflected self) becomes the object. In self-awareness, however, no difference, distance or separation exists between the knower and the known. Forced to apprehend itself as an object in an exercise of simple sense reflection, the Lockean subject never coincides with itself, caught as it is in a sequence of epistemic tail chasing (Locke, 1959 I; Zahavi, 1999). Such tail chasing, moreover, entails an infinite regress of selves themselves never self-aware. Locke’s failure stems from his restriction of intentionality to the model of object-awareness, the dyadic model of awareness, where all awareness requires a subject knowing an object.

Husserl’s account of the unity of (1) this dynamic, shimmering living-present makes possible the consciousness of (2) psychological or subjective time and (3) worldly or objective time provides an alternative to the traditional account of awareness as merely an objectivating relation of a subject to object (Brough, 1991; Sokolowski, 1973; Zahavi, 1999). By retaining the elapsed phase of consciousness and thereby the past of the object, retention unifies consciousness’ flow and the time-span of the perceived temporal object, thus providing at once a non-objective self-awareness and an objective awareness of spatio-temporal entities.

Despite the heady accomplishments of Husserl’s theory of time-consciousness as founded in the living-present’s double-intentionality, contemporary phenomenologists still disagree about Husserl’s discovery. Some commentators, under the influence of Derrida’s critique of Husserl’s theory of the living-present (Derrida 1973), express reservations over the legitimacy of the status of the living-present as an absolute, non-temporal temporalizing, arguing that it amounts to a mythical construct (Evans, 1990). Yet decisive refutations of these criticisms, based on their insensitivity to the nuances of Husserl’s theory, are plenty (Brough, 1993; Zahavi, 1999). Still, even those who accept its legitimacy disagree about how best to explain the relation between levels (1) and (2) of time-consciousness (see Zahavi, 1999; Brough 2002). Interestingly, the very complexities and details of Husserl’s theory of internal time-consciousness, which remain a central point of debate for contemporary phenomenologists, proved germane to phenomenology’s development and alteration throughout the Twentieth Century.

2. Heidegger on Phenomenology and Time

If the double-intentionality of Husserl’s theory of consciousness proves fruitful, it is because it allows us to given an account of the temporality of individual experiences (e.g., listening to a sentence) as well as the temporal ordering of a multiplicity of experience (e.g., recognizing the classroom to which I return each week as the same room differentiated over a span of time) and all of these experiences as mine, as belonging to me. Husserl’s first follower, Martin Heidegger, took up the benefits of Husserl’s theory and developed them into his own unique brand of phenomenology. In fact, Heidegger developed his brand of phenomenology precisely in light of Husserl’s reflections on the intentionality unique to absolute time-constituting consciousness. As we shall see, Heidegger might put the point more forcefully, claiming that he developed his phenomenology in opposition to Husserl’s theory of absolute time-constituting consciousness. In any event, we can begin by identifying a fundamental difference between Husserl and Heidegger: Husserl emphasized the retentional side of the life of consciousness because he was interested in cognition, which builds up over time, while Heidegger emphasized the protentional or futural side of the subject because he is more interested in practical activity (the “in order to” or “for the sake of”).

According to Heidegger, the essence of absolute time-constituting consciousness amounted to a subject divorced and isolated from the world because Husserl construed absolute consciousness as a theory only about the a priori, presuppositionless and essential structures of consciousness that made possible the unified perception of an object occurring in successive moments. As an alternative to what he considered Husserl’s abstracted view of the human being, Heidegger suggests that philosophy cannot advance a proper understanding of the being of the human being by bracketing its and the world’s existence. Instead, we must understand the human being as being-in-the-world, Dasein, literally there-being; we only can understand what the world contributes to us and what we contribute to the world if we consider each as co-dependent without reducing one to the other. To put it differently, Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology provides an “upward” oriented approach while Heidegger’s ontological phenomenology provides a “downward” oriented approach, and their approaches stem from their different views of time (Macann 1991).

Heidegger maintains that Husserl’s phenomenology proves inadequate to the task of understanding Dasein’s relation to the world because Husserl fails to articulate adequately the relation between consciousness, or being, and time. Specifically, Husserl’s construction of the fundamental form of intentionality as absolute time-constituting consciousness remains, according to Heidegger, prisoner to the bias of pure presence. As Heidegger puts it, the bias of pure presence entails the reduction of “being” to the moment that “is” fully articulated in the conscious now at the expense of absence, i.e., what falls outside the conscious now, i.e., the moments of past and future. Such a view of consciousness, Heidegger insists, capitulates to the prejudice of presence because it implies that something can appear to consciousness only in the form of an object now given or before one in person and unified by consciousness across its manifold moments (BT, § 67c). At a general level of intentionality, Heidegger wants to correct Husserl’s overly cognitive assessment of the subject. For Heidegger, an intention or intentio literally conveys a sense of “stretching out” or “straining” (Heidegger 1925). For Heidegger, Dasein is being in the world, a being with goals and projects toward which it comports itself or toward which it stretches out. The projects toward which it stretches itself makes Dasein fundamentally futural in its intentional directedness toward the world.

Having failed to investigate the practical comportment of the subject, Heidegger argues, Husserl's view of consciousness seems to reduce all awareness to awareness of an object in the present, thus reducing the past to the present and consciousness' self-awareness to an object among objects (Dahlstron 1999). Together, these related consequences motivate Heidegger’s conclusion that Husserl fails to perform the phenomenological reduction completely. Or, better, Heidegger concluded that the performance of the reduction adulterates the view of the subject and thus should be abandoned. Heidegger’s version of phenomenology thus does not begin from a phenomenological reduction although competing views of this matter exist (Crowell 1990; Blattner 1999).

As mentioned already, Heidegger’s very conception of Dasein as co-dependent with the world displays, he believes, his difference from Husserl’s view of the human being as absolute time-constituting consciousness. Put negatively and in terms of his History of the Concept of Time (1925), Heidegger criticizes Husserl for not considering fully the existence of the human being, bracketing its existence in favor of an analysis of the essential features of consciousness’ intentional structures (Heidegger 1925). Put positively and in terms of his Being and Time (1927), Heidegger claims that Dasein’s essence is its existence (BT § 9). Hence, one might claim, Heidegger introduces the movement of existential phenomenology, a development in phenomenology concerned with the very existence of the human being, which we have seen is termed Dasein by Heidegger.

Concern with Dasein’s existence as its essence does necessarily reduce to the assumption that Heidegger takes existence in the sense of biological or genetic determinants. Though such factors may condition Dasein’s manner of existing, they do not determine it, according to Heidegger. Dasein is neither fully determined nor uninhibitedly free (BT 144). She exists in the mode of her possibilities and her possibilities are motivated by environmental influences, her skills and interests, etc. (Blattner, 1999). Dasein, for Heidegger, is thus a being concerned about her being, reckoning with the world through her activities and commitments. Centering his existential phenomenology on how the world appears to a being concerned about its being, Heidegger’s inquiry starts from how Dasein comports herself as manifest in the everyday activities of her life, activities to which she commits herself or about which she cares (BT § 7). Heideggerian phenomenology thus begins from an interest in how the world appears to a being that cares about its existence, an intentional being but one who, in intending the world, is primarily practical and secondarily contemplative. Less concerned with the Husserlian search for presuppositionless certainty and essential structures, Heidegger’s existential phenomenology amounts to an interpretive description or hermeneutics that attempts to express the unexpressed (or articulate the pre-predicative) mode of Dasein’s engagement with the world (BT § 7). And this manner of engagement finds its fullest expression in Heidegger’s account of Dasein’s temporality.

a. Heidegger and Dasein’s Temporality

The notion of Dasein’s projects proves crucial to understanding Heidegger’s analysis of Dasein’s temporality and its difference from Husserl’s phenomenology. In discussing Dasein’s projects, Heidegger takes the term etymologically; to pro-ject means to put out there or to put forward. That Dasein projects itself in the world implies something fundamental about it. Dasein finds itself thrown into a world historical circumstance and projects itself in that world. Born (thrown) into a time and culture not of one’s choosing, Dasein always already exists in the world and suffers some limitations from which she nevertheless may wiggle free thanks to her interests and concerns about the world and her existence therein. The way things matter to Dasein—how she finds herself affected, in Heidegger’s language—and her skills and interest constitute different possibilities for her, different ways of being-in-the-world. These possibilities, in turn, manifest themselves in Dasein’s projects, i.e., in how she puts herself forward or projects or comports herself. These conditions suggest to Heidegger that the essential mode of being in the world for Dasein is a temporal one. Of the three temporal dimensions characterizing Dasein, we may say: First, the fact that Dasein finds herself thrown into a world and characterized by certain dispositions, etc. implies a “pastness” to her being. Second, the fact she projects herself implies a “futurity” to her being. And, third, the fact that she finds herself busied with the world as she projects herself in an effort to fulfill the present tasks required by the goal that is her project implies a “presentness” to her being (Blattner 1999).

The fundamental characteristic of the being that cares about its being, Dasein, then, is temporality. But things are not as simple (or common-sense) as they seem thus far. Time resembles Dasein insofar as time projects itself or stands outside itself in its future and past without losing itself—time and Dasein thus appear ontologically similar, or similar in their ontological structure. Since the question concerns the being for whom its being is a concern, and since the fundamental structure of this being is its temporality, philosophy’s very attempt to understand Dasein fundamentally concerns the relation between being and time at a pre-predicative level of worldly-engagement, a level prior to articulated judgment, prior to the conscious conceptualizations of traditional metaphysics or Husserlian phenomenology; hence, the title of Heidegger’s famous work, Being and Time (Richardson 1967). In Heidegger’s terms, an “authentic” understanding of the being concerned about its being rests upon a proper understanding of that being’s temporality.

To understand Dasein, then, Heidegger first distinguishes originary or authentic time understood as Dasein’s way of being in the world from worldly- and ordinary-time understood inauthentically or uncritically by the common-sense, pre-philosophical mind (BT § 80). As the labels imply, Heidegger articulates a hierarchical structure between these levels of time, much like Husserl’s levels of time (Sokolowski 1974). The hierarchical structure envisioned by Heidegger looks like this: World-time grounds ordinary-time, and both in turn are grounded by originary-time.

To establish the fundamental feature of Dasein as originary temporality, Heidegger distances his view of Dasein’s temporality from all common sense understandings of time as a series of nows, thereby deferring the common sense understanding of past as no-longer-now and future as not-yet-now. His position depends on a distinction between how time shows itself to Dasein as world-time and ordinary-time, the latter being derivative of the former. World-time denotes the manner in which the world appears as significant to Dasein in its everyday reckoning with the world at a practical level through its projects. For example, the world appears to an academic with certain significances or importance. Objects like chalk, books, computers, and libraries all manifest themselves with a particular value, and time does, as well (just consider the fact that the new year begins in late August rather than the first day of January). When I sit in my office, the approaching time of three in the afternoon does not appear merely as an indifferent hour on the clock. Rather, it appears to me as the time when, according to my project, I must head to class—just as it may appear to a postal work as the time when she should return to the station from her route. For me, the time-span of my class does not merely appear as seventy-five successive minutes. Rather, the classroom time of my project appears to me as the time when I project myself toward my students, the material for the day’s discussion and the material equipment in the class that facilitates my teaching well. If my class begins to go poorly, however, I may become self-conscious about how well I meet the demands of my project as a teacher. When the focus of my attention shifts from my project to my failures, the time of my project ceases to be my primary focus. Perhaps in this case I shift my focus to the passing nows or seconds of each increasingly long minute. If such a shift occurs, Heidegger might claim that I shift from the mode of world-time to the mode of ordinary-time, the time understood as a measurable succession of nows, seconds, minutes, etc.

This time that measures successive nows, Heidegger deems ordinary-time, which depends upon world-time. Heidegger distinguishes the two by pointing out that the significance which colors world-time goes missing in the view of ordinary time and time appears no longer as the span of my project but the mere succession of punctual, atomistic nows (the Newtonian scientific view of time as an empty container or place holder). When the time-span of practical reckoning with the world ceases for Dasein, ordinary-time emerges (BT§ 80; Blattner 1999). The above example does not quite get Heidegger exactly right, however, for in it I remain interested in human concerns (except that now I am worried about them). What the example does convey is the shift in understanding time from a mode of time as an extended reckoning with the world laden with significance to a mode of time considered as a purely abstract marching of moments, a view of time most accurately associated with the mathematical and scientific view of time (but not to the mathematician or scientist working with this view of time).

All of these distinctions between world- and ordinary-time are meant to elaborate Heidegger’s view that as a series of projects Dasein is no mere entity in the world but a temporal structure peculiar to its kind of being-in-the-world that makes manifest world- and ordinary-time. For Heidegger, the now denotes a mode of Dasein’s manner of being that discloses the appearance of the world to us, i.e., Dasein’s way of being-in-the-world. As a series of projects, Dasein in its originary temporality is characterized by a tripartite mode of transcendence or process (albeit a non-sequential process, since Heidegger has distanced himself from the ordinary view of time). First, as transcendence, as that which goes from itself and to which the world comes, Dasein has a futural moment. Second, as transcendence, as that which manifests itself non-objectively while reckoning with that which stands before it, Dasein has a present moment as the place wherein the world appears to, or manifests itself to, that which cares about it. And, third, as transcendence, as that to which the world comes, Dasein has a past moment because that which comes and manifests itself comes and manifests itself to one who always already is there (Heidegger 1927; Richardson 1967). As transcendence, as temporality, Heidegger describes Dasein as “ecstatic,” where ecstatic means to stand out (Sokolowski 2000). As the kind of being that is always outside itself without leaving itself behind, Dasein is a process of separating and consolidating itself (Sokolowski 1974). Outside of itself in the future, Dasein projects itself and reckons with that about which it cares; outside of itself in the present, Dasein makes manifest or present the appearance of that to which it goes out in its interest and according to its projects; outside of itself in the past, Dasein drags along that which it has been, its life, which, in turn, colors its present experiences and future projects.

This union of past, present and future as modes of originary-time in Dasein’s being-in-the-world renders Dasein authentic—one with itself or its own—because the projection into the future makes the present and the past part of Dasein’s project—its essence is its existence. However, insofar as I assume a project or life-orientation passively and without realizing myself as responsible for that project, argues Heidegger, I live inauthentically. And this is because I am engaged in the world without a full understanding of myself within the world. Put differently, rather than consciously make myself who I am through my choices, I passively assume a role within society—hence the temptation to label Heidegger an existentialist, a label the he himself rejected.

Many rhetorical differences exist between how Husserl and Heidegger execute the phenomenological method, particularly the phenomenology of temporality. Despite these differences, Heidegger begins his inquiry into Dasein’s temporality much like Husserl began his consideration of absolute, time-constituting consciousness. Just as Husserl established that neither the now nor the consciousness of the now is itself a part of time, Heidegger begins his account of Dasein’s originary temporality with the observation that neither the now nor Dasein is itself a part of time (BT § 62). As Heidegger puts it, as always already being-in-the-world, Dasein’s temporality is neither before nor after nor already in terms of the way common sense understands time as a sequence of discrete, empty nows (BT § 65). Hence, Heidegger translates Husserl’s account of the levels of time into an account of Dasein’s originary temporality. Moreover, Heidegger and Husserl seemingly end on the same note, for Husserl describes the living-present as a non-objectivating transcendence, an intentional being that transcends itself toward the world, and this description equally characterizes Heidegger’s more practically oriented discussion of Dasein’s originary-temporality. Like Husserl’s notion of the living-present, Heidegger’s theory of Dasein’s structure as originary temporality considers Dasein a mode of objectivating not itself objectified, the condition for the possibility of all awareness of objects at the levels of worldly- and ordinary-time (BT § 70).

Still, an important difference exists with respect to their phenomenologies of time and time-consciousness. First, despite the implicit levels of time, Heidegger employs the phenomenological reduction quite ambivalently and ambiguously. Second, Heidegger explicitly rejects the outcome of the phenomenological reduction as a privileged access to absolute time-constituting consciousness. Third, Heidegger quite unequivocally privileges the moment of the future in his account of Dasein’s originary temporality. By emphasizing Dasein’s being-in-the-world as manifest through its throwness in the world, and its care for the world as manifest through its projects, Heidegger’s focuses on Dasein’s futural character distinguishes his account from Husserl’s, for Husserl emphasized the moment of retention in the living-present almost to the exclusion of any remarks on protention, the anticipatory moment of the living-present. For these reasons, Heidegger considered his phenomenology radically different from Husserl’s. In particular, Heidegger thought Husserl’s overly cognitive account of how consciousness constitutes a unified temporal object across a succession of moments articulated only one of the many issues surrounding the temporality of Dasein, a merely scientific or cognitive account of how consciousness presents an object in the world to itself. Husserl’s restrictive phenomenology of time, Heidegger argues, overlooks the existential dimension of Dasein’s temporality, how Dasein reckons with the world at a tacit level rather than how it cognizes the world. And in particular, Heidegger thought philosophy could assess Dasein’s manner of reckoning with the world only by examining its futural moment as manifest in the projects that characterize Dasein’s mode of existence as the ongoing realization of its possibilities or construction of its essence.

3. Sartre and the Temporality of the “For-Itself”

Heidegger’s innovative contributions to the phenomenology of time did not go unnoticed by later phenomenologists. Both Sartre and Merelau-Ponty adopted Heidegger’s view of Dasein as being-in-the-world, an entity whose essence is its existence. The originality of Sartre’s phenomenology of time lies not in his reflections on time, which, as we shall see, return to some rather pedestrian claims. Rather, Sartre’s unique contribution to the phenomenology of time lies in his understanding of how consciousness, the “for-itself,” relates to the world, the “in-itself.” What in their discussions of this fundamental mode of transcendence Husserl labeled absolute time-constituting consciousness, and Heidegger Dasein, Sartre termed the “for-itself.” Given Husserl and Heidegger’s differing views of consciousness’ mode of intentionality and its fundamental self-transcending nature in its mode of temporality, Sartre’s theory presents an unlikely marriage of the two.

Fusing Heidegger’s view of being-in-the-world with what he considered was a greater fidelity to Husserl’s notion of intentionality, Sartre considered the being of the “for-itself” an ecstatic temporal structure characterized by a sheer transcendence or intentionality. In his earliest work, Transcendence of the Ego (1939), Sartre defines the “for-itself” by intentionality, i.e., the Husserlian claim that consciousness transcends itself (Sartre 1936). As self-transcending, Sartre further delimits the “for-itself” as a being-in-itself-in-the-world. The “for-itself” is a field of being always already engaged with the world, as Heidegger expressed Dasein as intentional and thrown. For Sartre, however, in its activity of engaging the world the “for-itself” reveals itself as nothing, a “no-thing,” or not-the-being-of-which-it-is-conscious. Sartre further qualifies the being of the “for-itself” that always already is engaged with the world as a non-positional consciousness (Sartre 1936). A non-positional consciousness always already engaged the world, Sartre contends, consciousness does not take a position on itself but on the world; hence, consciousness is non-positional. To evidence his point, Sartre maintains that I, when late for a meeting and running to catch the subway, do not primarily concern myself with myself but only have a consciousness of the subway to be caught (Sartre 1936). Rather than taking a position on myself as I pursue the subway, I implicitly carry myself along as I tarry explicitly with the world. For this reason, Sartre argues that absolute consciousness in Husserl’s sense of the living-present does not unify a temporal experience because the unity of consciousness itself is found in the object (Sartre 1936).

This Sartrean view that the experience unifies itself not only recalls Heidegger’s insistence that Dasein is a self-consolidating process, but also renders the notion of an absolute time-constituting consciousness superfluous, according to Sartre. Indeed, Sartre believed that a deep fidelity to Husserl’s theory of intentionality necessitated the abandonment of Husserl’s notion of absolute consciousness; hence, he dramatically declared that the Husserlian notion of an absolute consciousness would mean the death of consciousness (Sartre 1936). If one assumes, with Husserl, the notion of a living-present characterized by the moments of retention, primal impression and protention, Sartre argues, consciousness dies of asphyxiation, so to speak. A consciousness divided in this way, according to Sartre, amounts to a series of instantaneous and discrete moments that themselves require connection. Such an instantaneous series of consciousness amounts to a caricature of intentionality, in Sartre’s view, because this kind of consciousness cannot transcend itself; as Sartre expresses it, an internally divided consciousness will suffocate itself as it batters in vain against the window-pains of the present without shattering them (Sartre 1943).

Sartre’s critique of the living-present or absolute time-constituting consciousness seems rather questionable. Indeed, this image leaves one wondering whether or not Sartre derives this caricatured view of time-consciousness from a caricature of Husserl’s view of intentionality. Nevertheless, Sartre abandons Husserl’s notion of the tripartite structure of absolute time-constituting consciousness in favor of something like Heidegger’s notion of Dasein’s ecstatic temporality and its projects and possibilities. And yet Sartres’ adaptation of Heidegger’s notion of Dasein’s possibilities seems questionable as well. Recall that Dasein’s possibilities were not purely uninhibited, that Dasein did not simply choose its projects and possibilities from a position of total freedom because of its thrown condition and affective dispositions. Sartre’s theory of the “for-itself” seems to reject the kinds of limiting conditions entailed by Heidegger’s notion of thrownness. Indeed, Sartre’s melodramatic image of a consciousness with cabin fever implies that he cannot fully embrace any limiting factors on how the “for-itself” fashions its essence through its existence. For Sartre, the “for-itself” is radically free (Blattner 1999), and the result of Sartre’s reflections on the temporality of the “for-itself” is a rather pedestrian view of temporality.

Like Husserl and Heidegger, Sartre does not consider the past, present and future as moments of time considered as contents or containers for contents. Rather, each marks a mode in which the “for-itself” makes manifest itself and the world. But Sartre’s account neither surpasses nor achieves either the rigor of Husserl’s analyses or the descriptive quality of Heidegger’s. For Sartre, the past of the “for-itself” amounts to that which was but is no longer—similar to the view of the past itself, which Augustine rejected, as that which was but is no-longer. By mirror opposite, the future of the “for-itself” amounts to which it intends to be but is not yet—similar to the view of the future itself, which Augustine rejected, as that which will be but is not yet. And between the two, the present of the “for-itself” is that which it is not, for its being is characterized as being-not-the-thing-of-which-it-is-conscious—similar to the view of the present, which Augustine rejected, as the thin, ephemeral slice of the now.

4. Merleau-Ponty and the Phenomenology of Ambiguity: The Subject as Time

Whether Husserl’s, Heidegger’s or Sartre’s account, for phenomenology we cannot separate the issue of time from the issue of subjectivity’s structure. And Merleau-Ponty’s discussion of temporality in Phenomenology of Perception (1945) is no exception. It is, however, the most exceptional case of the intertwining of these issues. Developing Heidegger’s notion of Dasein as being-in-the-world, Merleau-Ponty emphasizes the being of Dasein as its bodily comportment and declares the body an essentially intentional part of the subject. Since Merleau-Ponty wants to make the body itself intentional, it is no surprise that he intertwines time and the subject, (in)famously remarking that “we must understand time as the subject and the subject as time” (Merleau-Ponty 1945).

To situate Merleau-Ponty’s account in this trajectory of phenomenological theories of time, it is useful to bear in mind that his account amounts to an innovative synthesis of Husserl and Heidegger’s understandings of time. Though the same can and has been said of Sartre’s account, Merleau-Ponty’s synthesis of Husserl and Heidegger differs from Sartre’s on three important scores. First, Merleau-Ponty rejects the dualistic ontology of the "for-itself" and the "in-itself" that led Sartre to rashly criticize Husserl's notion of absolute consciousness and superficially adopt Heidegger's phenomenological account of Dasein's temporality as manifest in its projects and possibilities." Second, Merleau-Ponty will not adopt Heidegger’s notion of Dasein’s temporality as an alternative to some purported shortcoming of Husserl’s account of the mode of intentionality unique to absolute time-constituting consciousness. Rather, third, more sensitive to the subtleties of Husserl’s theory of absolute time-constituting consciousness in the living-present than even Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty proposes to think the “unthought” of Husserl’s account of time through an intensified version of Heidegger’s account of the self’s inseparability from time.

From the outset, the “Temporality” chapter of his Phenomenology of Perception explicitly links time to the problem of subjectivity, noting that the analysis of time cannot follow a “pre-established conception of subjectivity” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). On the one hand, Merleau-Ponty rejects the traditional idealist conception of subjectivity in favor of an account of subjectivity in “its concrete structure;” on the other hand, since we must seek subjectivity “at the intersections of its dimensions,” which intersections concern “time itself and … its internal dialectic,” Merleau-Ponty rejects the realistic conception of subjectivity’s states as Nacheinander, i.e., successive, punctual, atomistic instants that lack intersection (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Hence, our understanding of Merleau-Ponty’s account of temporality and subjectivity’s temporality should follow the “triadic” structure of the Phenomenology: reject realism and idealism to demonstrate the merits of phenomenology (Sallis 1971).

The intellectualist account of time as (in) the subject fails because it extracts the subject from time and reduces time to consciousness’ quasi-eternity. The realist account of the subject as (in) time fails because it reduces the subject to a perpetually new present without unity to its flow. Both failures force upon the philosopher the realization that she can resolve the problem of time and subjectivity only by forfeiting the commitment to a “notion of time … as an object of our knowledge.” If we no longer can consider time “an object of our knowledge,” we must consider it a “dimension of our being” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Hence, an account of subjectivity’s temporality—of time as a dimension of our being—necessarily entails the development of a model of bodily consciousness’ pre-reflective, non-objectifying awareness beyond the “pre-established conception of subjectivity” that takes time as an object of our knowledge.

This means not that (1) “time is for someone” but that (2) “time is someone” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Phenomenologists and commentators alike often attribute (1) to Husserl and (2) to Heidegger. This should not surprise us given that Heidegger himself seemed to ascribe (2) to himself and his examination of Dasein’s lived-temporality in opposition to (1) Husserl’s account of how consciousness synthesizes an object across time. Often one of Husserl’s most sympathetic and accurate commentators (in Phenomenology of Perception, at least) Merleau-Ponty suggests that Husserl’s theory of absolute time-constituting consciousness in the living-present with its tripartite intentional structure provided an account of how (2) made time appear for reflection as (1). In short, Merleau-Ponty understood better than Heidegger that Husserl’s theory of the living-present articulated a theory of lived-time. What remained unthought by Husserl according to Merleau-Ponty was the inseparability of time and the subject in the theory of the living-present. Hence, an ambiguity intentionally pervades the account of time provided in Phenomenology of Perception.

This ambiguity at hand in Phenomenology of Perception stems from Merleau-Ponty’s honest admission that one never can fully execute the phenomenological reduction: “the most important lesson the reduction teaches us is the impossibility of a complete reduction” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Merleau-Ponty does not advocate discarding the reduction, however, as Heidegger somewhat equivocally did. Rather, he aims to explain that Husserl merely meant the reduction as a critical device that ensured phenomenologists would retain the stance of presuppositionlessness, the stance of a perpetual beginner. The motivation for Merleau-Ponty’s reading of Husserl’s phenomenological reduction is the fact that philosophical reflection always depends upon a pre-reflective lived experience, a lived experience that always occurs in the temporal flux of bodily consciousness. Under the influence of Heidegger’s theory of Dasein’s being-in-the-world, Merleau-Ponty fashions his starting point in the exploration of time as an attempt to provide an account of the structures of pre-reflective consciousness that make reflection possible. And much like Heidegger, who sought to articulate the pre-predicative element of lived experience, Merleau-Ponty believed that these structures of pre-reflective consciousness reveal themselves as primarily temporal. (For his part, Merleau-Ponty will refer to this pre-reflective consciousness as the “tacit cogito,” his expression for the non-objectivating, pre-reflective consciousness articulated throughout the phenomenologists we have considered in this entry.) Hence, one could argue, despite the watershed reflections Merleau-Ponty provides on embodiment, time proves the most fundamental investigation of Phenomenology of Perception (Sallis 1971).

Since phenomenology’s task includes providing an account of the pre-reflective’, lived experience that makes possible reflection, Merleau-Ponty turns to the structure of time as an exemplar of that which makes explicit the implicit. For Merleau-Ponty, time provides a model that sheds light on the structure of subjectivity because “temporal dimensions … bear each other out and ever confine themselves to making explicit what was implied in each, being collectively expressive of that one single explosion or thrust that is subjectivity itself” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Since to make explicit that which is implied in each moment means to transcend, to go beyond, one could say that Merleau-Ponty’s paradoxical expression means that time and the subject share the same structure of transcendence. That time is the subject and the subject is time means that the subject exists in a world that always outstrips her yet remains a world lived through by the subject (Sallis 1971). To clarify this structure, Merleau-Ponty invokes “with Husserl the ‘passive synthesis’ of time,” for the passive and non-objectivating characteristic of time’s structure in (what Husserl called) the living-present marks the archetype of the self’s structure, its transcendence that makes possible self- and object-manifestation. The Husserlian notion of double-intentionality thus pervades Merleau-Ponty’s account (Merleau-Ponty 1945).

That the matter of a passive and non-objectivating synthesis takes Merleau-Ponty to a consideration of the structure of absolute time-constituting consciousness’ double-intentionality—its transcendence and self-manifestation—as the structure of time we know to be the case for two reasons. First, Merleau-Ponty tells us, “in order to become explicitly what it is implicitly, that is, consciousness, [the self] needs to unfold itself into multiplicity;” second, in addition to the distinction just implied between non-objectivating and objectivating awareness, i.e., pre-reflective’ and reflective consciousness, Merleau-Ponty elaborates this manner of unfolding by claiming that “what we [mean] by passive synthesis [is] that we make our way into multiplicity, but that we do not synthesize it” as intellectualist accounts of time such as Augustine’s suggest. A synthesis of the multiplicity of time’s moments and the moments of the self must be avoided because it would require a constituting consciousness that stands outside time, and “we shall never manage to understand how a … constituting subject is able to posit or become aware of itself in time.” To avoid this error of separating consciousness from that of which it is aware, Merleau-Ponty appeals to Husserl’s theory of the living-present’s absolute flow, a “[consciousness that] is the very action of temporalization—of flux, as Husserl has it—a self anticipatory … flow which never leaves itself” (Merleau-Ponty 1945).

Merleau-Ponty seemingly provides an existential-phenomenological account of Husserl’s theory of absolute time-constituting consciousness’ double-intentionality. Nevertheless, he adopts Husserl’s theory according to his characteristic philosophy of ambiguity. Indeed, Merleau-Ponty insists that “it is of the essence of time to be not only actual time, or time which flows, but also time which is aware of itself … the archetype of the relationship of self to self” (Merleau-Ponty 1945). Ultimately with such remarks Merleau-Ponty was on the verge of bringing phenomenology toward a theory of ontology, which theory emerged in earnest in his later work, The Visible and the Invisible (1961). In that work, Merleau-Ponty expressly rejects his Phenomenology of Perception for having retained the Husserlian philosophy of consciousness. And this move from phenomenology to ontology manifests itself in some of his most provocative observations about time. To say that he moves from phenomenology to ontology is to say that he rejects any privileging of the subject or consciousness as constituting time either as a perceptual object or through a lived experience. As he puts it in the working notes of his The Visible and the Invisible, “it is indeed the past that adheres to the present and not the consciousness of the past that adheres to the consciousness of the present” (Merleau-Ponty 1961). Time now is characterized as an ontologically independent entity and not a construct disclosed by consciousness. It is the essence of time to be time that is aware of itself, to be sure. But this time is no longer an archetype of the self’s non-objectivating self-awareness. Rather, time constitutes the subject according to Merleau-Ponty, who puts to rest the phenomenological notion of absolute time-constituting consciousness, arguably Husserl’s most important discovery.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Augustine, A. Confessions. Trans. F. J. Sheed. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co, 1999.
  • Derrida, J. Speech and Phenomena. Trans. D. Allison. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
  • Heidegger, M. Sein und Zeit. Tübingen: Max Niemeyer, 1986; Being and Time. Trans. J. Macquarrie and E. Robinson. New York: Harper and Row, Publishers Inc, 1963.
  • Heidegger, M. Gesamtausgabe Band 20: Prolegomena zur Geschichte des Zeitbefriffs. Frankfut am Main: Vittorio Klosterman, 1979; The History of the Concept of Time Trans. T. Kisiel. Bloomington: Indian University Press, 1985.
  • Husserl, E. Zur Phänomenologie des inneren Zeitbewußtseins (1983-1917). Ed. R. Boehm. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966; On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1983-1917). Trans. J. Brough. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
  • Husserl, E. Analysen zur passiven Synthesis. Aus Vorlessungs- und Forschungsmauskripten (1918-1926). Ed. M. Fleisher. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966; Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic. Trans. A. Steinbock. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001. Husserl, E. Phatasie, Bildbewußtseins, Erinnerung. Ed. E. Marbach. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1980; Fantasy, Image-Consciousness, Memory. Trans. J. Brough. Dordrecht: Springer, 2005.
  • Husserl, E. Aktive Synthesen: Aus der Vorlesung ‘Transzendental Logik’ 1920-21. Ergäzungsband zu ‘Analysen sur passiven Synthesis.’ Ed. R. Breur. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2000; Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic. Trans. A. Steinbock. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001.
  • Husserl, E. Die ‘Bernaur Manuskripte’ über das Zeitbewußtseins 1917/18. Ed. R. Bernet and D. Lohmar. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001.
  • Locke, J. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. New York: Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Merleau-Ponty, M. Phenomenology of Perception. Trans. C. Smith. New York: Routledge & Keegan Paul Ltd, 1962.
  • Merleau-Ponty, M. The Visible and the Invisible. Trans. A. Lingis. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1969.
  • Sartre, J. P. Transcendence of the Ego. Trans. F. Williams and R. Kirkpatrick. New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 1957.
  • Sartre, J. P. Being and Nothingness. Trans. H. Barnes. New York: Philosophical Library, 1956.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Blattner, W. Heidegger’s Temporal Idealism. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Brough, J. B. “The Emergence of Absolute Consciousness in Husserl’s Early Writings on Time-Consciousness.” Man and World (1972).
  • Brough, J. B. “Translator’s Introduction.” In E. Husserl, On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917). Trans. by J. Brough. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
  • Brough, J. B. “Husserl and the Deconstruction of Time,” Review of Metaphysics 46 (March 1993): 503-536.
  • Brough, J. B. “Time and the One and the Many (In Husserl’s Bernaur Manuscripts on Time Consciousness),” Philosophy Today 46:5 (2002): 14-153.
  • Dalhstrom, D. “Heidegger’s Critique of Husserl.” In Reading Heidegger from the Start: Essays in His Earliest Thought. Edited by T. Kisiel and J. van Buren. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • de Warren, N. The Promise of Time. New York: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming.
  • Evans, J. C. “The Myth of Absolute Consciousness.” In Crises in Continental Philosophy. Edited by A Dallery, et. al. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Held, K. Lebendige Gegenwart. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966.
  • Kelly, M. “On the Mind’s ‘Pronouncement’ of Time: Aristotle, Augustine and Husserl on Time-consciousness. Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association, 2005.
  • Macann, Christopher. Presence and Coincidence. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
  • Richardson, W. Heidegger: Through Phenomenology to Thought. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1967.
  • Sallis, J. “Time, Subjectivity and the Phenomenology of Perception.” The Modern Schoolman XLVIII (May 1971): 343-357.
  • Sokolowski, R. Husserlian Meditations. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1974.
  • Sokolowski, R. Introduction to Phenomenology. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Wood, D. The Deconstruction of Time. Atlantic Highlands: Humanities Press International, 1989.
  • Zahavi, D. Self-awareness and Alterity: A Phenomenological Investigation. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1999.
  • Zahavi, D. Husserl’s Phenomenology. Palo Alto: Stanford University Press, 2003.

Author Information

Michael R. Kelly
Boston College
U. S. A.

Charles Sanders Peirce (1839—1914)

peirceC.S. Peirce was a scientist and philosopher best known as the earliest proponent of pragmatism. An influential and polymathic thinker, Peirce is among the greatest of American minds. His thought was a seminal influence on William James, his life long friend, and John Dewey, his one time student. James and Dewey went on to popularize pragmatism thereby achieving what Peirce’s inability to gain lasting academic employment prevented him from doing. A life long practitioner of science, Peirce applied scientific principles to philosophy but his understanding and admiration of Kant also colored his work. Peirce was analytic and scientific, devoted to logical and scientific rigor, and an architectonic philosopher in the mold of Kant or Aristotle. His best-known theories, pragmatism and the account of inquiry, are both scientific and experimental but form part of a broad architectonic scheme. Long considered an eccentric figure whose contribution to pragmatism was to provide its name and whose importance was as an influence upon James and Dewey, Peirce’s significance in his own right is now largely accepted.

Table of Contents

  1. Peirce’s Life
  2. Peirce’s Works and Influence
  3. The Interpretation of Peirce’s Philosophy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Peirce’s Life

Charles Sanders Peirce was born September 10th, 1839, in Cambridge, MA to Benjamin Peirce, the brilliant Harvard mathematician and astronomer, and Sarah Hunt Mills, the daughter of Senator Elijah Hunt Mills. Peirce led a privileged early life; parental indulgences meant his father refused to discipline his children for fear of suppressing their individuality. Further, the academic and intellectual climate of the family home meant intellectual dignitaries were frequent visitors to the Peirce household. These visitors included mathematicians and men of science, poets, lawyers and politicians. This environment saw young Charles Peirce’s precocious intellect readily indulged.

Peirce was the second of five children and four talented brothers, one of whom, James Mills Peirce (his elder brother), followed their father to a mathematics professorship at Harvard. Another brother, Herbert Henry Davis Peirce, carved out a distinguished career in the Foreign Service whilst Peirce’s youngest brother, Benjamin Mills Peirce, showed promise as an engineer but died young. The talent of the Peirce brothers, and particularly Charles, stems in large part from the colossal intellect and influence of their father.

Benjamin Peirce was instrumental in the development of American Sciences in the 19th Century through his own intellectual achievements and by lobbying Washington for funds. He was influential in the creation of Harvard’s Lawrence Scientific School and in the foundation of a National Academy of the Sciences. A further role, which was to prove important in Charles Peirce’s life, was Peirce Senior’s influential position in the U.S Coastal and Geodetic Survey from 1852 until his death in 1880. Benjamin Peirce provided a mighty role model, guiding the prodigious development of the young Peirce’s intellect through heuristic teaching. This gave Peirce a love of science and commitment to rigorous inquiry from a young age.

The influence of Benjamin Peirce on Charles’ intellect and, through refusing discipline, his fierce independence of spirit, is immense. The devotion to mathematical thoroughness and love of science colored Peirce’s endeavors for the rest of his life. Further, Peirce’s free spirited independence of mind undoubtedly contributed to the stubbornness and arrogance that surfaced in moments of adversity to compound the professional difficulties that he continually faced.

Despite some problems in school due to Peirce’s unsettled behavior, he graduated from Harvard in 1859. Peirce remained consistently in the lower quarter of his class but his indifference to the work and disdain at the intellectual requirements asked of him seem to be the cause of his poor performance. He remained at Harvard as a resident for a further year receiving a Master of Arts degree. Further, in 1863, he graduated from Harvard’s Lawrence Scientific School with the first Bachelor of Science degree awarded Summa cum Laude.

By 1863, with his education complete and having secured employment with the U.S Coastal Survey, Peirce’s marriage to Harriet Melusina Fay, a feminist campaigner of good Cambridge patrician stock, appeared to lay the foundation for a fruitful career and stable life. Peirce’s star began to burn brightly and in 1865 he delivered a lecture series at Harvard and gave the Lowell Institute Lectures a year later at age twenty-six. He published early well-received responses to Kant’s system of categories in 1867 and to Descartes account of knowledge, science and doubt in 1868.

His research in geodesy and gravimetrics at the U.S. Coastal Survey gained him international respect and, through European research tours, enabled him to make contact with British and European logicians. During an early research tour of Europe, Peirce’s work on Boolean logic and relatives gained him respect and attention from the British Logicians W.S. Jevons and Augustus De Morgan. In 1867, The Academy of Arts and Science elected Peirce as a member and The National Academy of Sciences followed suit in 1877. Peirce also began extra work at the Harvard Observatory in 1869 and published a book from his research there, the 1878 Photometric Researches.

Other work in Philosophy saw Peirce begin the now legendary Metaphysical Club in 1872 with, amongst others, William James. He also published his best-known body of work, The Popular Science Monthly series, in 1877 and 1878. This included “The Fixation of Belief” and “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” a continuation of his earlier anti-Cartesian thoughts and the first developed statements of his theories of inquiry and pragmatism. By 1879, Peirce obtained an academic appointment at Johns Hopkins University, teaching logic for the philosophy department. Here he continued to make strides in logic, developing a theory of relatives and quantifiers (independently of Frege). He published this work with his student O.H. Mitchell in the 1883 Studies in Logic. This volume contained a range of collaborative papers from Peirce and his JHU students.

All looked well for Peirce by the early 1880’s, and with the promise of tenure at Johns Hopkins he felt he could commit himself to a life pursuing his greatest love, logic. However, the beginnings of Peirce’s downfall were already stirring during this early successful period. Peirce’s work for the U.S. Coastal Survey and Harvard Observatory had led to tensions with the President of the Harvard Corporation, C.W. Elliot, about pay. Also, Peirce’s rise through the ranks of the Coastal Survey was partly nepotistic and at the expense of other men who expected to take the positions he gained. Further, the death of Benjamin Peirce in 1880 left Peirce without his most powerful backer in the Coastal Survey.

This need not have mattered had the Johns Hopkins appointment gone smoothly but earlier occurrences had also damaged this opportunity. Peirce had separated from his wife in 1876 and openly liased with a French mistress. Peirce’s wife had long suspected him of extra-marital affairs, even with the wives of his Coastal Survey colleagues, but the public nature of this particular liaison proved too much for her and she left him. Peirce lived openly with his mistress during the period from separation in 1876 to divorce in 1883 when he and his mistress married, seven days after the decree fini.

The affair itself need not have caused excessive moral consternation, but the indecorous manner in which it was conducted resulted in outrage: both the patrician families of Cambridge, and academic establishment of Harvard and Johns Hopkins were appalled. The President of JHU, Daniel Coit Gilman, withdrew renewal of all contracts in Philosophy, and later reinstated all positions but that of Peirce, thereby “resigning” Peirce from his post. Peirce had lost the only academic position he was ever to hold. His problems continued to mount.

The Coastal Survey, now his only means of income, was subject to government audit after accusations of wide spread financial impropriety. Although subsequent reports exonerated Peirce, the new climate led him into difficulties with work, and his inclination to complete it. By 1891 Peirce had left his only secure means of income at the Coastal Survey and, living on a Pennsylvanian farm purchased from inheritance in 1888, he retreated to a life of hardship and academic isolation with his now frail and consumptive second wife, Juliette.

Despite repeated efforts by friends to find him work, Peirce’s poor reputation consistently saw him rejected. Such was Peirce’s low standing that a lecture series organized by William James and Josiah Royce in 1898 (initially in the hope that it might open a door to a position at Harvard) took place in a private home in Cambridge. It seems that fear of Peirce’s potential to corrupt the morals of the young led the Harvard Corporation to refuse permission for Peirce to lecture on campus. Later lectures at Harvard in 1903 did take place on campus after the Corporation had softened its stance, but the academic establishment, particularly at Harvard, never came to accept or forgive Peirce.

Lecture series, such as those organized by James and Royce, along with hack writing for dictionaries and popular magazines, were Peirce’s main philosophical outlet and primary source of income. Attempts to secure money from the Carnegie Institution to fund a full statement of his philosophical system in 1902 failed and between the 1890’s and his death from cancer in April 1914, Peirce lived in a state of penury struggling to find an outlet for his work. Some important publications appeared in The Monist during the 1890’s and again in1907 following a brief renewal of interest in his work. This was due in large part to James’ acknowledgment of his role in founding pragmatism. However, Peirce’s published work petered out into a series of rejections and incomplete projects and although he did not stop writing until his death, he failed to publish a mature account of his philosophy whilst alive. Peirce died lost and unappreciated by all but a few of his American contemporaries.

2. Peirce’s Works and Influence

During his lifetime, Peirce’s philosophy influenced, and took influence from, the work of William James. The two men where close friends and exchanged ideas for most of their adult lives. However, despite similarities and mutual influence, they strove hard to distinguish their own brand of pragmatism from each other’s. This is particularly so after James’ California Union Address where he attributed the discovery of the doctrine to Peirce and identified the early papers, “The Fixation of Belief” and “How to Make our Ideas Clear,” as the source of pragmatism. Peirce thought James too “nominalistic” in his pragmatism and too wary of logic; James thought Peirce too dense and obscure in his formulations. Nevertheless, the connections between the two founding fathers of pragmatism are clear.

Also well-acknowledged is the influence of Peirce upon John Dewey and a generation of young Johns Hopkins logic students and colleagues including: Oscar Mitchell, Fabien Franklin and Christine Ladd-Franklin. Peirce’s work at JHU had a profound effect upon his students and, although John Dewey initially found Peirce’s logic classes obscure and not like logic as he understood it, he later came to realize the importance of Peirce’s approach. Peirce’s own response to Dewey’s pragmatism was much the same as his response to James’: too “nominalistic.” Dewey, however, fully acknowledged the influence and importance of Peirce, even hailing his work as more pragmatic in spirit than that of William James.

Within the field of logic, Peirce’s greatest passion, he also exercised some influence in his own lifetime. Peirce’s development of Boolean algebra influenced the logician and mathematician Ernst Schröder, with whom Peirce exchanged correspondence and mutual admiration. The outcome of this influence is an interesting and often unacknowledged effect upon the development of modern logic: it is Peirce’s account of quantification and logical syntax that leads to twentieth century logic, not Frege’s. Of course, Frege’s work is important and predates much of Peirce’s development by five years or so, but at the time, it was all but ignored. It is from Peirce that we can trace a direct line of influence and development, through Schröder to Peano, and finally to Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica.

Beyond his work in the development of pragmatism and modern logic, Peirce identified his own ideas with that of James’ Harvard colleague, Josiah Royce. Peirce felt that of all his contemporaries, Royce’s work most closely reflected his own, and indeed, Peirce’s semiotics and metaphysics greatly influenced Royce. Royce’s respect for Peirce’s work continued with the relish that Royce displayed at the chance to edit the eighty thousand or so pages of unpublished manuscripts sold to Harvard in 1914 by Juliette Peirce, after Charles’ death. Unfortunately, Royce died in 1916, too soon to accomplish anything with the disorganized manuscripts. However, by bringing the papers to Harvard, Royce effectively secured the long-term influence of Peirce beyond his own lifetime.

The editorial task of organizing the Peirce papers did not continue smoothly after Royce’s death, but eventually passed to a young C.I. Lewis, who had already shown some appreciation of Peirce’s work in the development of logic in his 1918 publication A Survey of Symbolic Logic. Although Lewis quickly found the task of editing Peirce’s manuscripts not to his taste, his contact with them allowed him to develop answers to his own philosophical problems and much of Peirce’s systematicity is reflected in Lewis’ work. Instead, the Peirce papers that inspired both Royce and Lewis came to fruition under the joint editorship of Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss. Their editorial work culminated in six volumes of The Collected Papers of C.S. Peirce between 1931 and 1935, and for fifty years this was the most important primary source in Peirce scholarship. Hartshorne and Weiss remained interested in Peirce’s work throughout their working lives. Further, both men supervised the young Richard Rorty, which may account for some of his early favorable accounts of Peirce. Of course, Rorty later rejected the value and status of Peirce as a pragmatist.

In the late 1950’s, The Collected Papers, begun by Hartshorne and Weiss, were completed with two volumes, edited by Arthur Burks. Burks had, prior to his editorship of The Collected Papers, worked on some Peirce inspired accounts of names and indexical reference. Burks’ readings of Peirce on names and indices have recently inspired the Referential/Reflexive account of names and indexical expressions by the Stanford philosopher, John Perry.

Other than The Collected Papers and the influence that it has had, Peirce was published posthumously in 1923 in a volume called Chance, Love and Logic, edited by Morris Cohen who worked on the Harvard manuscripts to create this small volume. Along with an appendix in Ogden and Richards’ 1923, The Meaning of Meaning, based mainly on Peirce’s correspondence with his English friend, Victoria Lady Welby, Peirce exercised his most interesting and most contentious influence.

The young Cambridge philosopher and mathematician, F.P. Ramsey, knew of these early volumes, and was greatly interested by them. Ramsey clearly acknowledges the influence of Peirce in his 1926 article, “Truth and Probability,” where he claims to base certain parts of his paper upon Peirce’s work. Ramsey’s interest in Peirce is not contentious. The influence of Ramsey upon the later Wittgenstein is also widely acknowledged. However, the subject of some speculation is the influence of Peirce upon Wittgenstein, via Ramsey. There is no direct acknowledgment of Peirce by Wittgenstein, but Ramsey’s review of the Tractatus recommends Peirce’s type/token distinction to Wittgenstein, a recommendation that Wittgenstein accepted. Wittgenstein did not hide the effect of Ramsey’s advice on his later work, and although the exact nature of the advice is unknown, it is common knowledge that Ramsey thought the Tractatus could overcome its problems by moving towards pragmatism. Potentially then, Peirce can claim an indirect influence over the later Wittgenstein.

The effect of Peirce’s work, through The Collected Papers and early posthumous publications, is not merely of historical interest though. His work is in many ways still alive in contemporary debate. Within pragmatism, the work of both Susan Haack and Christopher Hookway has a distinctly Peircian flavor. Susan Haack in particular has vigorously defended Peirce’s claim to pragmatism against the anti-Peircian strain of Rorty’s new pragmatism. A further influence in contemporary debate has been the presence of Peircian views in the Philosophy of Science. Peirce’s views on science combine distinctly Popperian and Kuhnian views and Popper even names Peirce as one of the greatest of philosophers. Also within the philosophy of science, Peirce’s theories of induction and probability have influenced the work of R.B. Braithewaite. Further, Peirce’s theory of the economics of research is now coming to be understood as a potential response to problems like Hempel’s Paradox of the Ravens and Goodman’s New Puzzle of Induction.

In other areas, some modern epistemologists have embraced virtue epistemology, an attempt to conduct the theory of knowledge by defining the qualities of the knower or true believer rather than knowledge or true belief directly. Two of the leading players in this approach to epistemology, Christopher Hookway and Linda Zagzebski, both acknowledge the thought of Peirce upon their work, and as a precursor to their discipline. Also, Jaakko Hintikka and Risto Hilpinen et al. point out the debt that their long running project, to define semantic concepts like quantifiers and propositions in terms of zero-sum games, owes to Peirce’s work.

Apart from these strictly analytic influences, Peirce also exercises some influence in European philosophy. Particularly noteworthy is the influence of Peirce upon the Neo-Kantian philosophies of Karl-Otto Apel and Helmut Pape, which emphasize a more Kantian reading of Peirce’s philosophy. Perhaps most important, though, is Peirce’s influence upon Jürgen Habermas. Habermas uses and refines crucial elements of Peirce’s account of inquiry in his own political and social philosophy. Particularly central is Peirce’s notion of a community of inquirers. For Peirce, the community of inquirers is a trans-historical notion, acting as a regulative ideal for the growth of knowledge through science. Habermas adapts the Peircian notion of community in two ways. First, the regulative ideal becomes a more concrete notion ranging across actual communities and political and social dialogue occurring within them. Second, the scientific and epistemological purpose of the intersubjective community becomes a social and political purpose on Habermas’ view. Clearly, Habermas uses Peirce’s ideas in ways that move away from simple Peircian concerns. Nonetheless, Peirce’s ideas are of importance to him.

Besides these influences, the potential for further and continued involvement of Peirce’s thought in philosophical debate has grown considerably over the last few years as the tools of Peirce scholarship have entered a new period. The Collected Papers edited by Hartshorne, Weiss and Burks, have been an invaluable source for anyone interested in Peirce, but the editorial policy employed there is idiosyncratic in the way it gathers Peirce’s work together. The Collected Papers takes Peirce’s manuscripts from across a fifty-year period and edits them topically. Often, Peirce’s views from early and late work are presented together as though they are a single connected thought on some topic. This has the effect of making Peirce’s thought seem disjointed and often self-contradictory within the space of two or three passages. However, new tools are now emerging and since the early 1980’s, the reorganization of Peirce’s manuscripts in chronological order by the Peirce Edition Project has given rise to eight volumes of a projected thirty. This reorganized edition, published as The Writings of C.S. Peirce, has already led to an increased understanding of the subtle development of Peirce’s ideas. The hope is that as The Writings of C.S. Peirce continues to grow, our understanding will grow also and with this greater understanding will come increased involvement of Peirce’s ideas in contemporary debate.

3. The Interpretation of Peirce’s Philosophy

Peirce’s approach to philosophy is that of an established scientist; he treated philosophy as an interactive and experimental discipline. This scientific approach to Philosophy, which Peirce labeled “laboratory philosophy,” reflects important themes throughout his work. Pragmatism, for instance, takes the meaning of a concept to depend upon its practical bearings. The upshot of this maxim is that a concept is meaningless if it has no practical or experiential effect on the way we conduct our lives or inquiries. Similarly, within Peirce’s theory of inquiry, the scientific method is the only means through which to fix belief, eradicate doubt and progress towards a final steady state of knowledge.

Clearly then, Peirce is a scientifically minded philosopher, and on some readings appears to trump the Vienna positivists to a verificationist principle of meaning and scientific vision of philosophy. In other respects, though, Peirce often focuses on topics outside the remit of scientific and naturalistic philosophy. For instance, Peirce wrote extensively on issues in metaphysics where he defined universal categories of experience or phenomena, after Kant. He also constructed vast systems of signs and semiotics. Of course, all of these endeavors are colored, in some respects, by his distinctly scientific turn of mind. However, the point is that Peirce’s philosophical writings cover more than half a century and a wide range of topics.

The breadth of Peirce’s philosophical interests has lead to some difficulty in interpreting his work as a whole. How, for instance, do his metaphysical writings relate to his work on truth and inquiry? Thomas Goudge (1950) argues that Peirce’s works consist of two conflicting strands, one naturalistic and hard headedly scientific, the other metaphysical and transcendental. Others take Peirce’s work, both naturalistic and transcendental, to be part of an interrelated system. Murray Murphey (1961) argues that Peirce never quite succeeded in integrating his various philosophical themes into a unified whole and identifies four separate attempts. However, the view that a single architectonic system exists has since replaced this view. Important work by Christopher Hookway (1985), Douglas Anderson (1995) and Nathan Houser (1992) shows how fruitful this treatment of Peirce is and now constitutes the orthodox position in interpreting his work. Their view treats Peirce’s philosophy as a panoramic connected vision, containing themes, issues and areas that Peirce worked upon and moved between at various points in his life. However, treating Peirce’s work as a connected whole can prove awkward when encountering this material for the first time.

Peirce is a difficult philosopher to understand at times, his work is full of cumbersome terminology and often assumes knowledge of his other work. Often, trying to understand Peirce’s theories on individual topics is an involved task in itself; attempting to understand how it fits into a broader, interrelated, system can seem like an unwelcome complication. One approach, then, is to tackle Peirce’s work topic by topic without too much emphasis upon the interconnectedness of this work. The most common topics are Peirce’s account of truth and inquiry or his pragmatism. If the systematic nature of Peirce’s philosophy is approached at all, it is after some familiarity with individual topics has been attained. This approach is not without its merits since it makes Peirce more immediately digestible. However, it can have the effect of leaving certain important elements in Peirce’s work unappreciated. For instance, why is there an all-pervasive penchant for triads, or “threes,” in Peirce’s work? This is a common Peircian theme and is best appreciated by understanding the systematic vision that Peirce has for his philosophy.

The difficulty, then, is finding a balance between the completeness of the architectonic approach to Peirce’s work, and its related complexity. The strategy employed here is to introduce Peirce’s work through a series of entries which detail both his broader philosophical system and individual topics within it. The hope is that the reader can approach Peirce’s work topic by topic through reading the relatively self-contained entries on individual elements of his philosophy. However, the provision of an introductory entry giving an overview of Peirce’s philosophical system enables the reader to see how these individual topics hang together within his broader vision.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first wide spread presentation of Peirce’s work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982-. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce’s views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor).
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2), (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce’s writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries, particularly by Nathan Houser in Volume 1.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, D. 1995. The Strands of System. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press).
    • A systematic reading of Peirce’s thought which, in its introduction, makes an in-depth breakdown of the elements of the system and their relation to each other. Its main body reproduces two important papers by Peirce with accompanying commentary.
  • Brent, J. 1993. Charles Sanders Peirce: A Life. (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The definitive biography of Peirce, it takes a warts-and-all approach to Peirce’s character and life, and attempts to show the relationship between the events of his life, and his philosophical development.
  • Goudge, T. 1950. The Thought of C.S. Peirce. (Toronto: University of Toronto Press).
    • Early and important view of Peirce’s philosophy which emphasizes an unbridgeable schism between the scientific and metaphysical strands of Peirce’s work. Long superseded but still a good secondary source.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1985. Peirce. (London: Routledge and Kegan Paul).
    • Important treatment of Peirce as a systematic philosopher but with emphasis on Peirce’s Kantian inheritance and later rejection of the transcendental approach to truth, logic and inquiry.
  • Murphey, M. 1961. The Development of Peirce’s Philosophy. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
    • Early work that identifies four periods and separate systems in Peirce’s work. Again, superseded by the single system interpretation of Anderson, Hookway and Houser et al.

Author Information

Albert Atkin
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom

Liezi (Lieh-tzu, cn. 4th cn. B.C.E.)

The Liezi (Lieh-tzu), or Master Lie may be considered to be the third of the Chinese philosophical texts in the line of thought represented by the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, subsequently classified as Daojia (“the School of the Way”) or Daoist philosophy. Whether Master Lie existed as an actual person or not, the text bears his name in order to indicate its adherence to the line of thought and practice associated with this name. This appears to be true of other early texts, such as the Laozi, the Heguanzi, and the Guiguzi, for example. Despite the controversy over its dating and authorship, this is a philosophical treatise that clearly stands in the same tradition as the Zhuangzi, dealing with many of the same issues, and on occasion with almost identical passages. The Liezi continues the line of philosophical thinking of the Xiao Yao You, and the Qiu Shui, from which it takes up the themes of transcending boundaries, spirit journeying, cultivation of equanimity, and acceptance of the vicissitudes of life. It also continues the line of thought of the Yang Sheng Zhu, and the Da Sheng, developing the theme of cultivating extreme subtlety of perception and extraordinary levels of skill. It is noteworthy that the Liezi stands out as more apparently metaphysical than the cosmologically oriented texts of the Zhou and Han dynasties (such as the Laozi, Zhong Yong, and the Xici of the Yijing). That is, it goes further towards explicitly articulating a conception of the ‘transcendent’ or ‘metaphysical’: that which is beyond the realm of observable things that come into and go out of existence, and that is prior to, superior to, and responsible for it as its necessary condition. While the Liezi does not unambiguously articulate the logical conditions that define transcendence as such (a necessarily asymmetrical relation of dependence between the world and its source), still, the traces of transcendence are intriguing and worth philosophical investigation.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. The Liezi Text
  3. Central Concepts in the Liezi
    1. Chapter 1: Tian Rui (Omens of Nature)
    2. Chapter 2: Huang Di (The Yellow Emperor)
    3. Chapter 3: Zhou Mu Wang (King Mu of Zhou)
    4. Chapter 4: Zhong Ni (Confucius)
    5. Chapter 5: Tang Wen (The Questions of Tang)
    6. Chapter 6: Li Ming (Effort and Circumstance)
    7. Chapter 7: Yang Zhu (Yang Zhu)
    8. Chapter 8: Shuo Fu (Explaining the Signs)
  4. Key Interpreters of Liezi
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

The character after whom the text is named is called Lie Yukou; his personal name, “Yukou,” means ‘guard-against-bandits.’ According to the Liezi itself, he lived in the Butian game preserve in the principality of Zheng, but was eventually driven by famine to live in Wei. The first chapter of the Zhuangzi refers to Liezi, and so, if this character corresponds to a really existing person, he must have existed prior to the writing of that chapter. This means that Liezi would have flourished some time before the end of the fourth century BCE. W. T. Chan places him as early as the fifth century. He was said to have been a student of Huzi (Huqiu Zilin), and a fellow student of Bohun Wuren (wuren: “no person”), and teacher of Baifeng. However, it is not clear whether there ever really existed a philosopher named ‘Liezi.’ Liezi is not explicitly mentioned in any of the early classifications of philosophical schools: those of Xunzi, Zhuangzi’s Tianxia chapter, and Sima Qian. Moreover, the character is understood to be an adept with superhuman powers. Zhuangzi, for example, says that he had the ability to fly for fifteen days at a time. Yang Bojun insists that, despite the mythologizing of the character, there is sufficient scattered evidence that there probably did exist a real person on whom the stories were based. Nevertheless, scholars have for centuries been suspicious of the existence of Master Lie, and of the authenticity of the text.

The ideas expressed throughout the text have clear affinities with the philosophies expressed in the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, and so categorizing these three as belonging to roughly the same tradition of thought is not problematic—even if the authors, contributors, and commentators did not think of themselves as proponents of a single doctrine, or as belonging to the same ‘school’. The Laozi is sometimes quoted with approval, although the quotations are attributed either to the Book of the Yellow Emperor, or to Lao Dan. While the Liezi does not refer to the Zhuangzi, it shows clear signs of influence from the latter (even though the character Liezi is supposed to have lived before Zhuangzi). This indicates a later dating of much, if not all, of the text.

Unlike the Laozi, this text displays little interest in critiquing the Ruists or Confucians, and unlike the Zhuangzi, does not criticize the ‘Ru Mo’—the Ruists and Mohists. On the contrary, it shows signs of reconciliation of Ruist and Daoist ideas: many Ruist principles are given Daoist interpretation, and Confucius appears in several stories as a wise and sympathetic character, if not a sage. Incidentally, that one of the chapters of the text is named after Confucius should not, by itself, be taken as significant. The chapter is so named, solely because the name of Confucius appears at the beginning of the first story. This eclectic reconciliation of Ruism, Daoism, and on occasion Mohism, is indication of the post-Qin provenance of the relevant passages.

While Zhuangzi’s own philosophy is believed to have exerted a significant influence on the interpretation of Buddhism in China, the Liezi may constitute a possible converse case of Mahayana Buddhist influence on the development of the ideas of Zhuangzi. Stories here and there resonate with some of the tenets of Sanlun (the Chinese form of Madhyamaka), Weishilun (the Chinese form of Yogacara), and Huayan. The resonances are highly suggestive, but the evidence is not decisive enough to be sure of any influence, either of Buddhist ideas on the Liezi, or vice versa. If the conjecture of Buddhist influence is correct, it would also place the relevant passages of the text well into, if not after, the Han dynasty.

2. The Liezi Text

The text, like many other early Chinese ‘books,’ is a collection of various materials, written at different times, some of which can also be found in other sources. Liu Xiang, the Western Han scholar, says in his preface that he edited and collated material from twenty chapters distributed in other collections, and reduced them to eight by eliminating excess materials. The extant eight chapter version, with Zhang Zhan’s commentary, dates from the Western Jin (approximately three centuries later).

Each chapter contains a series of stories, each developing some theme whose antecedents can often be discerned from the Laozi or the Zhuangzi. Several themes are developed in each chapter, and some chapters overlap in themes, but as with the Zhuangzi, each chapter has its distinctive ‘feel’. About one quarter of the text consists of passages that can be found in other early works, such as the Zhuangzi, the Huainanzi, and the Lüshi Chunqiu. The remaining majority of the text, however, is distinctive in style, and with the exception of the “Yang Zhu” chapter quite consistent in the world view and way of life that it expresses. Most of the text contains material of philosophical interest. However, myths and folk tales based on similar themes, but with no apparent philosophical value, can be found side by side with stories that have profound philosophical significance.

The “Yang Zhu” chapter is problematic. While the earliest reference to the text (Liu Xiang) lists a chapter with the title, the currently extant version of this chapter has little to nothing in common with the rest of the book, and indeed espouses a hedonist philosophy of pleasure seeking that is inconsistent with the cultivation of indifference toward worldly things that is characteristic of much of the rest of the book, and of the Zhuang-Lie approach to Daoism in general.

The “authenticity” of the Liezi text has been challenged by Chinese scholars for centuries, and it has accordingly been taken by perhaps a majority of scholars to be a forgery. Their claim is that the textual material was compiled, edited, and written by a single author who intended to deceive readers into believing that this was an ancient text. Certainly, the text is an eclectic compilation consisting of early materials which can be found in other texts, together with original material dating from well after the time period from which its supposed author is said to have lived. However, as Zhuang Wanshou points out, the characteristics cited for classifying the text as a forgery—being composed by several authors over several centuries, and drawing from several sources—apply to other philosophical texts which are not dismissed as “forgeries,” including, for example, the Analects and the Zhuangzi. Moreover, it is not clear why this should be considered sufficient reason to reject, and neglect, the Liezi as a philosophical text. Moreover, from a purely philosophical point of view, whoever wrote the text, and whenever it was written, it contains much material that expresses distinctively recognizable strands of Lao-Zhuang thought, with sufficient complexity and sophistication to warrant serious study as the third of the important Daoist philosophical texts.

3. Central Concepts in the Liezi

a. Chapter 1: Tian Rui (Omens of Nature)

In the opening chapter of the Liezi we can identify the beginnings of an articulation of a concept of a ‘beyond’ (wai) that bears a striking resemblance to Western concepts of the “transcendent” or “metaphysical.” I mean these terms more or less synonymously, and in the strong philosophical sense of: that which lies beyond the realm of experience, and stands independently as its necessary condition. The idea of a ‘beyond’ occurs several times, in different formulations, but it is unclear how close this gets to the Western concept of a metaphysical transcendent. In particular, while the formulations suggest an asymmetric relation of dependence—namely, that a realm beyond the conditions of existing things is itself a necessary condition for the existing, changing, things that we encounter, and not vice versa—it does not clearly and explicitly assert it as a necessarily asymmetrical relation. Still, this chapter goes much further than the Laozi or the Zhuangzi toward articulating anything like this sort of transcendence, and so if we are going to claim to find anything like it in the Daoist tradition, our best bet is with the Liezi.

The chapter begins with an account of something that is the condition of the existence of living and changing things. At first glance, this appears to define a metaphysical beyond that can only be hinted at negatively: that which is beyond birth and transformation (the unborn/not-living, busheng, and the unchanging, buhua), and which is responsible for all birth and transformation. It is the unborn that is able to produce the living, and the unchanging that is able to change the changing. This strongly suggests a dependence of the living on the unborn, of the changing on the unchanging. However, while the text explicitly asserts that the unborn/not-living can produce the living, it does not explicitly deny the opposite. Without this explicit assertion of necessary asymmetry, it has not, strictly speaking, claimed a transcendent role for the unborn/unchanging. Thus, the passage can still be read as entirely consistent with the typical Daoist claim that the stages of living and not living, and of change and not changing, are interdependent contrasts, each giving rise to the other.

The chapter also contains an explicit cosmology (a philosophical account of the basic makeup of the world), and, asks about the beginnings of heaven and earth. The text postulates several great beginnings, (taiyi, taichu, taishi, taisu), which successively mark an undifferentiated stage, a stage of energy (qi), a stage of embodied form (xing), and a stage of intrinsic stuff (zhi). The energies (or perhaps forms, or stuff, the text is not explicit) divide into two kinds: the light becomes the ‘heavens’ (tian), the heavy becomes the earth, and the blending of the two becomes the human realm. Here again, with questions about ‘great origins,’ we sense a possible concern with transcendence, but everything that is explicitly stated is compatible with an organic, naturalistic cosmology, and does not require the imposition of the full-blooded concept of metaphysical transcendence.

There follows an intriguing passage in which it is stated that that which produces, shapes, and colors, has not yet tasted, existed, or appeared. Here, an attempt is made to articulate a distinction between a realm of form that has perceptible properties, and a realm prior to form, shape, smell, etc which is responsible for these, and which itself does not have these perceptible properties. This passage is significant, because in this case, an asymmetry is for the first time explicitly articulated. However, the asymmetry is not asserted as a necessity, but merely as a contingent fact, thus still leaving room for interpreting the producer and the produced as interdependent.

After considering the cosmic beginnings, the chapter ends with a discussion of the possible end of the world. If the heavens (and the earth) are accumulated qi, then why might they not eventually come apart? Several answers are considered: they couldn’t come apart, because they are qi of a specific kind. Or: they could come apart, but that is so far off it is not something we need worry about. Or: It is beyond our knowledge whether they could ever come apart. Finally, Liezi’s answer is that both alternatives are “nonsense”: to say that tiandi will perish is nonsense, and to say that it won’t is nonsense. While the logic of this answer is left incomplete, it reminds us of the logic of the Sanlun philosophy of Madhyamaka Buddhism. The Sanlun philosophy tries to articulate a rejection of simplistic dichotomies, and encourages a third way (a ‘middle path’) that involves transcending the perspective from which we must choose between such dichotomies. There are other places in the Liezi where these hints of Sanlun emerge more explicitly, suggesting the possibility of Buddhist influence, and thereby a later dating of the text (or at least of these passages). It is worth noting, however, that the anti-metaphysical stance of Madhyamaka Buddhism is inconsistent with the positing of a realm of transcendence—thereby complicating the issue still further.

b. Chapter 2: Huang Di (The Yellow Emperor)

The Daoists are known for extolling the marvellous abilities of people with extraordinary skills, and the Liezi is no exception. Stories abound of people who perform breathtaking, sometimes life-threatening, feats with tranquil ease and flawless artistry. While these people are not directly called sages, they are nevertheless looked up to as exemplary of the ideals of the Daoist way of life.

What they have is extraordinary ability, but it is not to be understood mere daring or bravery; nor is it to be understood as qiao, skill, dexterity, or craftsmanship, in the ordinary sense of those terms. It is not simply a matter of technique, but rather of inner cultivation. These abilities arise when one understands and follows the natures or tendencies of things, and it is an understanding that cannot be put into words. As such, it is not something that one consciously knows: one might say, using the language of Polanyi, that it is a form of “tacit knowing.” Liezi emphasizes the point with examples of unwitting sages, people who naturally have a potent ability, and yet have no idea of how extraordinary they are, and indeed whose ignorance is in some cases the necessary condition of their exceptional abilities.

In other cases, or for other people, years of fasting, training, and discipline are necessary to cultivate such abilities. To engage successfully with things requires penetrating through to the inner tendencies of things, to that which lies at the root of things, beyond their observable shape and form. The sage unifies his nature (xing), energies, and potency, with a single-minded concentration on the task at hand, aware of nothing except the circumstances and the goal, and is subtly in tune with the innermost core of things. When one is able, in this way, to penetrate to the place where things are ‘forged’, one is no longer at their mercy, and then the extremes of life’s circumstances cannot ‘enter’ (ru) to disturb one’s tranquility.

c. Chapter 3: Zhou Mu Wang (King Mu of Zhou)

What is waking experience, or dream experience? What is the relation between them? From a realist perspective, only waking experience is experience of reality, while dream experience is an ‘imaginary’ reproduction of the experiences without there being a corresponding dream reality. From an idealist perspective, the difference is less radical. It is, to a large extent, a difference in degree, rather than in kind. Waking experience is simply more coherent and more enduring, and is shared by others. What, then, if there were a kind of dream experience that was more coherent and more enduring? How would we draw the distinction then? What if there a kind of dream experience that could be shared with others? Would this not constitute a radical challenge to the distinction between waking and dreaming?

It is notable that the term huan is used to talk of the status of dreams, and thereby also of our waking experience to the extent that it too is considered to be dreamlike. The term means ‘illusion’, and suggests a very strong devaluation of what we ordinarily take to be genuine experience. In some sense, all experience is for us a magnificent, magical display, a phantasmagoria of sensory delights and horrors. Seen in this light, dream and waking experience become equalized: the reality of dreams is of the same order as the illusory nature of waking experience. From an idealist perspective of this sort, waking experience is ultimately no different from a dream. This is reminiscent of the Vedanta conception of maya, and indeed it is noteworthy that huan is the word standardly used to translate the Buddhist concept of maya. If it is the case, as most scholars argue, that there is no evidence of an indigenous Chinese tradition developing a distinction between the realms of ‘Appearance’ and ‘Reality’, then this would seem to indicate the possibility of Indian influence, most probably via the Yogacara incorporation of Vedanta philosophical concepts, imparted through its Chinese form of Weishilun.

d. Chapter 4: Zhong Ni (Confucius)

In the opening of this chapter, Confucius is found lamenting his lack of success in life, and his beloved disciple Yan Hui reminds him to cultivate indifference. Confucius responds in a manner that attempts to provide a reconciliation of Daoist virtue and cultivation with Ruist social involvement. Thus, coming to terms with tian and ming means more than simply accepting everything that happens to us with equanimity or indifference. Equanimity means rejoicing in nothing, but to rejoice in nothing requires rejoicing equally in everything. And to rejoice equally in everything requires being fully immersed in each and every one of our concerns, in our successes and failures. Thus, it is entirely appropriate, and consistent with Liezi’s form of Daoism, for Confucius to grieve that he did not succeed, during his lifetime, in transforming the state. This is a very clever reinterpretation of the Daoist cultivation of equanimity that makes it compatible with care and concern for social ventures. It takes Daoist logic that leads us away from worldliness, and follows it through so that it leads us right back into the thick of things. In doing so, it anticipates the Chan (Zen) response to Huayan Buddhism.

The intuitive ‘non-knowing’ of the Huang Di chapter is then applied to the subject of governing in order to describe a Daoist kind of ‘mystical’ rulership. One rules most skilfully by doing ‘nothing.’ The ruler cultivates an intuitive sensitivity to the natures of people and circumstances, and becomes so sensitive to all that happens that he or she can respond appropriately, without necessarily knowing, or consciously planning, or taking deliberate control, or making crude judgments regarding what is right and what is wrong.

e. Chapter 5: Tang Wen (The Questions of Tang)

This chapter opens up another kind of metaphysical problem: the problem of what things are like ‘outside’ of the realms of familiarity, and gives expression to a sense of the magnificence of the world: vast, unencompassable dimensions, and the extraordinary variety of things, creatures, cultures, and places. The problem is posed, and different answers are suggested, but I think it would be a mistake to try to find a consistent metaphysical position asserted as the correct one. Rather, the text engages in a literary-philosophical exploration of some possibilities. Also, several implications are explored, drawing together concepts from other chapters: sameness and difference, the vast and the petty, the infinite and inexhaustible, the skill of the imperceptible.

As we move from region to region throughout its boundless extent, we meet up with increasingly strange varieties of things. Yet despite their differences, are they after all just variations on a theme? All things are different, and yet is it not also the case that all things are in a deeper sense the same? In either case, to one who is truly at home in the universe, the extraordinary and wonderful varieties are remarkable but not to be considered weird. Thus, unlike our typical tendency to marvel at the peculiar weirdness of the ‘exotic,’ this chapter encourages us to de-exoticize the unfamiliar.

Going beyond the limits is conceived not simply as moving outwards along a trajectory, but as occuring between levels of containment. To go outside, or beyond, is to move to a higher level within which the previous level is contained. But this very movement immediately suggests the possibility of iteration, and thus leads to the Daoist formulation of a problem concerning finitude. Are there ultimate limits of containment to how far we can go beyond? If so, is there such a thing as what is beyond those limits? Or is the process limitless? If so, can there be such a thing as what is beyond the limitless?

Conversely, the ‘inexhaustible’ refers to movement in the opposite direction, inwardly from the vast to the minuscule. At its extreme, the inexhaustible, infinitesimal within things, approaches nothing. The more subtle and minuscule it gets, the more it escapes the purview of ordinary sensory awareness. It is the inexhaustible subtleties within things that enable things to be what they are, and so sensitivity to such subtleties can and should be cultivated. Since such an awareness is unavailable to ordinary perception, and since as we have seen in Chapter 2 it is also non-verbal, it is thought of as a kind of intuitive embodied insight that remains beneath the level of conscious awareness. When we cultivate this, we are able to sense the innermost tendencies of things, respond to changes before they manifest, and thus act without interfering. The sagely charioteer, for example, does not force the horses to move, nor fight the terrain, but has a subtle sensitivity to the terrain, and to the every movement of the horses, and is able to guide, even to “control”, merely by following intuitively, tacitly, the tendencies of things.

This distinction between the vast and the petty also has more familiar, less mystical application. Great things can be achieved by focusing on the here and now: no need for a long term plan, for far reaching vision. Just keep doing what you can, no matter how dense and shortsighted: the results will take care of themselves. Great things can thus be achieved unwittingly, stupidly even. Hence, the stupid man is able to move the mountain.

f. Chapter 6: Li Ming (Effort and Circumstance)

The chapter raises the question: to what must we attribute the vicissitudes of life, our successes and failures? Is it really something that is in our control, that can be changed by li, human effort? Or is it, after all, just circumstance, ming, in this case not inappropriately interpreted as ‘fate’? That is, is it something our efforts can affect, or is it something we can do nothing about?

In the Zhuangzi, an answer is given that is reminiscent of Stoicism: that the circumstances into which we emerge are simply the way things are. We must learn to accept our lot, ming, with equanimity. There appear to be two answers given in the Liezi, one of which, given at the end of the chapter, echoes this answer of Zhuangzi. But at the beginning of the chapter, the two alternatives of li and ming are rejected. Instead, the answer is given that we must learn to accept that whatever happens, it is just the way things are, Gu. In fact, these two answers are not different, since the sense being expressed by gu in the Liezi is precisely what is expressed by the word ming in the Zhuangzi. The answer to this problem lies in the fact that the word ming has two senses. In the Zhuangzi and other early texts, ming is the circumstances that surround us, the way things are. It also has aspects of the following senses: life, lifespan, lot (in life), calling, naming, command, circumstance, that into which we are thrown, and with which we must come to terms. Insofar as this does not necessarily imply an external determining force, it differs from the concept of ‘fate.’

But it also may be used in a less sophisticated sense to refer to an external force which is in control of things, that is “fate” or “destiny”. This sense of the word can be found as early as the Mozi, in the Fei Ming (Against Fate) chapter. When the Liezi contrasts li and ming, it is in this cruder sense that ming is being rejected. Instead, the word gu is used in this text as a synonym for what was expressed by ming in the Zhuangzi. What is being denied, then, in these passages is that neither effort, nor any external force of destiny is truly in control of what happens. Thus, it is the dichotomy of personal control vs external control that is being rejected: it is not that success or failure is determined by us, nor is it the case that success or failure is determined by external circumstances. Nor, incidentally, is the point that there is always a combination of both effort and circumstance. Rather, whatever effort is involved, and whatever the circumstances, in all cases it is always a matter of how things just happened to turn out. In the end, even if neither effort nor circumstance determine the outcome, yet the outcome has simply followed its gu, the way it is.

g. Chapter 7: Yang Zhu (Yang Zhu)

The ideas of this chapter are so inconsistent with the rest of the text that it is clearly out of place. Exactly how and why it made its way into this collection, and succeeded in remaining there, is unclear. It espouses a hedonistic philosophy: Life is short; Live for pleasure alone; Don’t waste time cultivating virtues. If it bears any relation to Daoist philosophy, then it appears to be a sophomoric misunderstanding of the ideas of the Xiao Yao You chapter of the Zhuangzi. Graham suggests that it comes from a former Yangist phase of the author’s philosophical career, and that it was written, in part, to provide a foil against which to understand his later philosophy.

h. Chapter 8: Shuo Fu (Explaining the Signs)

This chapter is a mixed collection of stories, exploring themes of varying philosophical significance. A recurring theme expresses a particularist attitude that might be thought of as a kind of casuistry (according to which judgments are made by comparing the particularities of individual cases), or contextualism (according to which judgments ought to be made only when all differences of context are factored in). Several stories are told, in each of which we have apparently similar circumstances in which the outcome varies significantly. The point is to emphasize that we cannot simply assume that what appear to be similar situations require similar responses from us. We must treat each case in the light of its own unique circumstances. That is, instead of looking for simple rules to be applied at all times, we must instead learn how to read the subtleties of the ‘signs’. This may be done either through a clear and explicit awareness that arises from careful observation, or through an intuitive and embodied understanding that arises from familiarity and practice.

4. Key Interpreters of Liezi

The first eight chapter edition of the text may have been edited and compiled by Liu Xiang (77—6BCE). If this edition ever existed, it is no longer extant. Zhang Zhan’s annotated edition (around 370 CE) became popular from the Tang dynasty, and this edition with Zhang’s commentary has become the received version. A second philosophical commentary was produced by Lu Chongxuan in the 8th century). After the Tang, doubts began to be raised about its authenticity, beginning with Liu Zongyuan (773—819). Unfortunately, most of the scholarly discussion around this text has concerned its dating and “authenticity,” and consequently, there has been little to no serious interpretation of the text regarding its philosophical content.

The concern to dismiss the text increased in the early twentieth century. In 1919, Ma Shulun argued that it was a forgery made by students of Wang Bi, stealing materials from many prior philosophical sources. In 1920, Takeuchi Yoshio published a refutation of Ma Shulun, but acknowledged that the text was a late compilation. In 1949, Cen Zhongmian, attempted to defend the text, using modern techniques of linguistic analysis to argue that it dated from the late Zhou, but his argument has not been influential. In 1927, Liang Qichao even suggested that it was in fact the commentator Zhang Zhan himself who forged the book.

In 1979, two excellent editions of the Liezi with important critical commentaries were published: one by Yang Bojun in Beijing, the other by Zhuang Wanshou in Taibei. It is important to note that Zhuang’s so-called Du Ben not merely a study book, but is a significant work in its own right.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Barrett, T. H. “Lieh Tzu.” In Early Chinese Texts: A Bibliographical Guide, ed. Michael Loewe (Berkeley: Society for the Study of Early China and the Institute of East Asian Studies, University of California, Berkeley, 1993), 298-308.
  • Graham, A. C. The Book of Lieh-tzu. New York: Columbia University Press, 1960.
  • Graham, A. C. “The Date and Composition of the Lieh-Tzu.” In Studies in Chinese Philosophy and Philosophical Literature (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990), 216-282.
  • Yang, Bojun. Liezi Jishi. Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1979.
  • Wieger, Leo. Taoism: The Philosophy of China. Burbank, CA: Ohara Publications, 1976.
  • Zhuang, Wanshou. Xinyi Liezi Duben. Taibei: Sanmin Shuju, 1979.

Author Information

Steve Coutinho
Muhlenberg College
U. S. A.

Harold Henry Joachim (1868—1938)

Harold Henry Joachim (1868-1938) was a minor idealist philosopher working in the neo-Hegelian tradition that dominated British philosophy at the end of the nineteenth century. At the time, this tradition was divided into two main camps: personal idealism and absolute idealism. Joachim was affiliated with the latter camp, whose most prominent representative was F. H. Bradley. Although Joachim has frequently been characterized as a mere disciple and promulgator of Bradley’s views, there are instances in which Joachim parts ways with Bradley, showing himself to be an independent and original thinker. These instances will be highlighted below.

Apart from a series of extensive commentaries on individual works by Aristotle, Spinoza and Descartes and an important English translation of Aristotle’s De Generatione et Corruptione, Joachim’s most important work was The Nature of Truth (1906), in which he argued for a coherence theory of truth on the basis of his idealist metaphysics. Joachim’s theory and others like it became a principal foil for G.E. Moore and Bertrand Russell as they began to break with the neo-Hegelian (a.k.a British Idealist) tradition, and to move toward what eventually became Analytic Philosophy. This dynamic between the neo-Hegelian tradition and the emerging Analytic tradition will be illustrated below by considering Bertrand Russell’s criticisms of Joachim’s theory of truth.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. The Influence of F.H. Bradley
  3. Writings
  4. The Nature of Truth
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Books
      2. Articles
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Harold Henry Joachim (1868-1938) was born in London on 28 May 1868, the son of Henry Joachim, a wool merchant, and his wife, Ellen Margaret (née Smart). Joachim’s father had come to England from Hungary as a child. Both sides of his family were musical—his uncle was the famous violinist, Joseph Joachim, and his maternal grandfather was the organist and composer, Henry Thomas Smart—and Joachim himself was a talented violinist: talented enough to stand in occasionally for absent members of his uncle’s quartet. Early in life Joachim had thought of becoming a professional violinist, but he seems to have been too intimidated by his uncle’s reputation. As a don at Oxford, however, he played frequently, organized his own amateur quartet, and was president of the University Musical Club. Musical examples and analogies appear frequently in his philosophical writings.

Joachim was educated at Harrow School and at Balliol College, Oxford, where he studied with the neo-Hegelian philosopher, R.L. Nettleship. He gained a first in classical moderations in 1888 and in literae humaniores in 1890. In 1890 he was elected to a prize fellowship at Merton College. He lectured in moral philosophy at St. Andrews University from 1892 to 1894, returned to Balliol as a lecturer in 1894, and in 1897 became a fellow and tutor in philosophy at Merton. In 1919 he moved to New College in consequence of his appointment to the Wykeham professorship of logic, a position he held until his retirement in 1935. In 1907 he married his first cousin, Elisabeth Anna Marie Charlotte Joachim, the daughter of his famous uncle. They had two daughters and one son. Brand Blanshard, who was one of his students, described him as ‘a slender man with a mat of curly reddish hair, thick-lensed glasses, a diffident manner, and a gentle, almost deferential way of speaking’ (Blanshard, 1980, p. 19). Joachim was elected fellow of the British Academy in 1922. He died at Croyde, Devon on 30 July 1938.

2. The Influence of F.H. Bradley

Joachim was a minor philosopher working within the neo-Hegelian idealist movement which dominated British philosophy at the end of the nineteenth century (cf. the article on Analytic Philosophy, section 1). Joachim’s contributions to neo-Hegelianism came late in the day, when the movement was already in decline, and this has meant that, although his work (especially the work he did before the First World War) was taken seriously when it appeared, it did not have the lasting significance that its initial reception suggested.

In Joachim’s day, Neo-Hegelianism was divided into two broad camps: the personal idealists, like J.M.E. McTaggart, who held that reality consisted of a multiplicity of inter-related individual spirits; and the absolute idealists, led by F.H. Bradley, who held that it consisted of a single, relationless, spiritual entity, the Absolute. Joachim belonged firmly in the absolutist camp.

There is no doubt that the strongest philosophical influence on Joachim was F.H. Bradley. T.S. Eliot, one of Joachim’s students, wrote that Joachim was ‘the disciple of Bradley who was closest to the master’ (Eliot, 1964, p. 9) and this seems to have been a widely held opinion. There is, indeed, a degree of truth in this, but it should not be exaggerated. Bradley and Joachim had a long professional association: Joachim’s most productive years as a philosopher were spent at Bradley’s college, Merton, where they had neighbouring rooms. (G.R.G. Mure (1961), reported that Joachim would shut the windows when Mure started to criticize Bradley, lest the great man hear.) Nonetheless, there does not seem to have been a close personal relationship between the two philosophers, for Joachim was diffident and Bradley was overbearing. Since Bradley did no teaching, students who went to Oxford to learn Bradley’s philosophy usually ended up learning it from Joachim (who probably did a better job of teaching it than Bradley would have done, for Joachim was, by all accounts, an able teacher). After Bradley’s death, it was Joachim who edited Bradley’s Collected Essays and who was responsible for completing Bradley’s famous final essay on relations which was included in that collection. A number of letters from Bradley to Joachim have been preserved, but only one from Joachim to Bradley (Bradley 1999).

Joachim’s reputation as Bradley’s closest acolyte was a mixed blessing. On the one hand, so long as Bradley remained a force to be reckoned with in philosophy, it ensured that Joachim’s work received careful attention; but once Bradley became a figure of mainly historical interest, Joachim’s own contributions to philosophy were largely forgotten.

While there is no denying Bradley’s influence on Joachim, it should not be thought that Joachim’s own philosophical writings were merely elaborations of Bradley’s position. In particular, the widely held view that Joachim’s most important original work, The Nature of Truth (1906), was an elucidation (or at most an extension) of Bradley’s views on truth, is a mistake, and one which has led to decades of misunderstanding about the theory of truth that Bradley actually held. Joachim’s theory is plainly one that is tenable only within a broadly Bradleian metaphysics, and at the time Joachim wrote no other such theory had been elaborated in detail. Nonetheless, Joachim himself was far too careful a commentator to suggest that the coherence theory of truth he put forward in The Nature of Truth was actually held by Bradley. Moreover, when Bradley himself started writing about truth (at about the time Joachim’s book was published), he made hardly any reference to Joachim. His collection of papers on the topic, Essays on Truth and Reality, contain exactly one reference to Joachim: he says merely that Joachim’s book is ‘interesting’ and that Joachim ‘did ... well to discuss once more that view [which both of them rejected] for which truth consists in copying reality’ (Bradley, 1914, p.107). This is surely a case of damning by faint praise. And it is not insignificant that Joachim’s work on Bradley’s Nachlass (his posthumously published collected papers) mentioned above was assigned to him not by Bradley himself, but by Bradley’s sister, who was his literary executor. Thus there is no indication that Bradley thought his mantle should be passed to Joachim.

And there is at least one important respect in which Joachim would have wanted to disown Bradley’s mantle. Right at the end of his posthumously published Logical Studies he ventures a fundamental criticism of Bradley’s metaphysics for not being Hegelian enough. Bradley’s Appearance and Reality ends, famously, with a chapter called ‘Ultimate Doubts’. The title might seem ironical for a chapter in which he says that ‘our conclusion is certain, and ... to doubt it logically is impossible’ (Bradley 1893, p. 459), but there is one respect in which the doubt is real. While Bradley maintains that he has proven that the Absolute is a perfect system in which ‘every possible suggestion’ has its logically ordained place, yet this ‘intellectual ideal’ is impossible for us to grasp: ‘The universe in its diversity has been seen to be inexplicable.... Our system throughout its detail is incomplete’ (ibid., p. 458). In this respect, Joachim maintains, Bradley’s Absolute differs from Hegel’s, and Hegel’s is much to be preferred (Joachim 1948, pp. 284-92). In this, Joachim sides with the many neo-Hegelian critics of Bradley who objected to his generally sceptical conclusions: indeed, Bradley himself described his book as ‘a sceptical study of first principles’ (Bradley 1893, p. xii). Such scepticism was not for Joachim, though there is nothing in his entire corpus which indicates how the Absolute might, in detail, be made explicable.

3. Writings

A complete list of Joachim’s philosophical publications appears at the end of this article. Here we will survey his most significant writings.

Joachim’s most important original work in philosophy was The Nature of Truth (1906), a defence of the coherence theory of truth. Truth was also the topic of three of the six papers he published in Mind. Joachim’s views on truth will be the subject of the next section, we will forego further commentary on them here.

Apart from his work on truth, almost all his other work consisted of scholarly studies of particular works of ancient or early modern philosophers. His first book was an important commentary on Spinoza’s Ethics (1901), and he followed this with two translations and commentaries (De Lineis Insecabilibus and De Generatione et Corruptione) for W.D.Ross’s edition of Aristotle’s works in English (1908, 1922). These Aristotle translations were probably his most enduring work. His translation of De Generatione et Corruptione remains in print, having been reprinted as recently as 1999, and it was for many years the standard translation, being superseded only in 1982 by C.J.F. Williams’ translation in the Clarendon Aristotle Series.

The only other works he published in his lifetime were three papers (two on scholarly points in ancient philosophy), his inaugural lecture as Wykeham professor (a work scathingly reviewed by Russell, 1920), a book review, and a letter to the editor of Mind.

Considerably more work appeared after his death than he had published in his lifetime. The posthumous works were based upon the meticulously written out lecture courses he had given at Oxford over many years. With one exception, Logical Studies (1948), the posthumous volumes were all scholarly studies of specific works of other philosophers: a commentary on Spinoza’s Tractatus de Intellectus Emendatione (1940), a study of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (1951), and a study of Descartes’ Rules for the Direction of the Mind (1957). In these commentaries, Joachim was concerned primarily with an exact explication de texte, and they are renowned for their meticulous attention to detail. Stuart Hampshire (1951, pp. 9-10) said that Joachim had written two of the three ‘most careful studies of Spinoza in English’. The carefulness of their exposition makes them well-worth reading even today, though the philosophical language in which they are couched and the philosophical presuppositions underlying it belong to the largely forgotten era of late nineteenth-century idealism. While they remain valuable commentaries, their neo-Hegelian ambiance can be intrusive: there are occasions where Joachim seems to suggest that if Spinoza had been a better metaphysician he would have been Bradley.

There is no doubt that Joachim found the close reading of classic philosophical texts especially congenial. He seems to have started the practice as an undergraduate under the guidance of J.A. Smith at Balliol. His relationship with Smith was close: starting in the 1890s, they frequently worked together on the interpretation of Greek philosophical texts and from 1923 to 1935 they gave a class each week during term devoted to the reading of selected texts from Aristotle (Joseph, 1938, pp. 417-20). During the vacations, Joachim prepared for these classes with extraordinary thoroughness. Smith recalled that he was often prepared to suggest improvements to the text, especially as regards punctuation. Indeed, T.S. Eliot (1938) credited his understanding of the importance of punctuation to Joachim’s exposition of the Posterior Analytics. Rather more surprising, Eliot also said that Joachim taught that ‘one should avoid metaphor wherever a plain statement can be found’. This is surprising because Joachim’s own works, like Bradley’s, are replete with metaphors, often in places where a plain statement is imperatively demanded. Indeed, his style seems to me a serious weakness, especially in his original philosophical work. Where argument is called for, he has a tendency to rhapsodize instead.

As mentioned above, only one of Joachim’s posthumous books was a work of original philosophy. This was his Logical Studies (1948), edited by L.J. Beck from the fully written-out lectures Joachim delivered as Wykeham professor from 1927 to 1935. Although Beck in the Preface reports Joachim’s opinion that these are ‘the fullest written expression of his own philosophical opinion’, they are, frankly, disappointing. It is indeed astonishing that material like this should have been taught as logic at a major university as late as the 1930s. Although it was no doubt inevitable that the major advances in formal logic of the previous fifty years would not have featured in the lectures of Oxford’s professor of logic, it is notable that he did not cover any of the main topics of traditional logic either – topics like induction and deduction, names, propositions, inference, and modality; the sort of material to be found in W.E. Johnson’s Logic, which came out about the time Joachim took up his chair. The material Joachim covers is much more concerned with metaphysics and epistemology than with logic.

The work contains three studies. The first deals with the question ‘What is Logic?’ After a long discussion, Joachim concludes that it is ‘the Synthetic-Analysis or Analytic-Synthesis of Knowledge-or-Truth’ (1948, p. 43). It is impossible to make adequate sense of this cumbersome phrase without an extended discussion of the metaphysics of Absolute Idealism, but such a discussion falls beyond the scope of this article (see the articles on Analytic Philosophy and G.E. Moore for brief descriptions of the metaphysics of Idealism). Suffice it to say that, by ‘Synthetic-Analysis or Analytic-Synthesis’, Joachim meant a certain kind of mental activity that was simultaneously analytic and synthetic:

… it brings out, makes distinct, the items of a detail by bringing out and making distinct the modes of their connexion, the structural unity (plan) of that whole, of which they are the detail; in a word, so far as it is a two-edged discursus, analysing by synthesizing and synthesizing by analysing. (p. 38)

and that, by ‘Knowledge-or-Truth’, he meant reality and mind considered together as an internally-related whole:

It is truth … in the sense of reality disclosing itself and disclosed to mind – to any and every mind; and, being truth, it is also and eo ipso knowledge – i.e. the whole theoretical movement, the entirety of cognizant activities, wherein the mind (any and every mind qua intelligent) fulfils and expresses itself by co-operating with, and participating in, the disclosure. (p. 55)

Any greater clarity on these matters is, as already stated, impossible to achieve without a protracted discussion of Idealist metaphysics; but even with such a discussion there remain questions about the ultimate cogency of these views.

The second (and longest) study is an attack on the distinction between immediate and mediate (or, as Joachim puts it, discursive) knowledge. The bulk of the study is taken up with an attack on the notion of the given (a datum), whether derived from introspection, sense-experience or conceptual intuition, on which immediate knowledge could be founded. The final study concerns truth and falsehood, and reprises the views he set forth in The Nature of Truth. Joachim’s views on truth as presented in both of these texts will be considered in the next section.

4. The Nature of Truth

By far, Joachim’s most important contribution to philosophy was his book The Nature of Truth (1906), in which he defends a coherence theory of truth. Even so, nowadays the book is probably best known for having provoked a long response from Bertrand Russell (Russell, 1907), in which Russell set forth most of what have become the standard arguments against coherence theories of truth.

Joachim’s book had four chapters: the first was a critique of the correspondence theory of truth; the second a critique of Russell’s and Moore’s early identity theory of truth ‘as a quality of independent entities’ (see the article on G.E. Moore, section 2b); the third put forward Joachim’s own coherence theory; and the fourth dealt with the problem of error. The third part of Joachim’s Logical Studies dealt with essentially the same material in the same order, but from a slightly different point of view.

In Logical Studies Joachim approached the topic through an investigation of the nature of judgements (or propositions) as the bearers of the predicates ‘true’ and ‘false’. He first rejects, on grounds drawn mainly from the first chapter of Bradley’s Principles of Logic, the view that a proposition is a mental fact which represents an external reality (this is the sort of view that gives rise to the correspondence theory of truth). Bradley’s argument, which Joachim repeats, was that beliefs, considered purely naturalistically as mental states, could not be considered to represent or be about anything outside themselves, any more than any other natural state could.

Secondly, he attacks the view that a proposition is an objective, mind-independent complex—the view which underlies the Russell-Moore identity theory. Against the Russell-Moore view, he has two objections: first, that the theory can give no account of how the mind can access the proposition; second, that the theory is forced to postulate false propositions as having the same mind-independent complexity as true ones. There is an interesting shift of emphasis here from his treatment in The Nature of Truth. In that earlier work, Joachim emphasized the first objection and based it firmly in his neo-Hegelian doctrine of internal relations—for which he was roundly criticized by Russell (1907; see below). In Logical Studies, the doctrine of internal relations is more or less ignored, and Joachim concentrates on the strangeness of Russell’s and Moore’s propositions, especially the strangeness of false propositions.

The third view, which Joachim endorses, is the idealist view in which the judgement is, to put it entirely in his own words, ‘the ideal expansion of a fact – its self-development in the medium of the discursus which is thought, and therefore through the co-operative activity of a judging mind’. A judgement is true ‘because, and in so far as, it stands or falls with a whole system of judgements which stand or fall with it’ (Joachim, 1948, p. 262).

This account, though lacking a good deal in precision, is actually clearer than that given in The Nature of Truth, where readers are bewildered by a variety of different accounts, and are left to work out for themselves how these might be regarded as descriptions of a single concept of truth rather than of several different concepts. It is worth quoting a few of Joachim’s differing statements from The Nature of Truth, since it will give a taste of the exegetic difficulties involved in his work. In one place he says that anything is true which is ‘a “significant whole”, or a whole possessed of meaning for thought’ (Joachim 1906, p. 66). Later he says that truth is a ‘process of self-fulfilment’ and ‘a living and moving whole’ (ibid., p. 77). Again later he says that it is ‘the systematic coherence which characterizes a significant whole’ and ‘an ideally complete experience’ (ibid., p. 78).

All of this is considerably less helpful than it might be, though it does serve to introduce what can be taken as the central notion of Joachim’s theory, that of a ‘significant whole’. Unfortunately, Joachim gives two different accounts of even that central notion: on pages 76 and 78 it is ‘an organized individual experience, self-fulfilling and self-fulfilled’; on p. 66, however, ‘A “significant whole” is such that all its constituent elements reciprocally involve one another, or reciprocally determine one another’s being as contributory features in a single concrete meaning.’

This latter account is clearer and more helpful in understanding his actual view. The idea that all the elements of a significant whole ‘reciprocally involve’ one another amounts to the claim that the intrinsic properties of each part determine the intrinsic properties of all the others. It is the intrinsic properties of each element that are determined because Joachim, in common with other neo-Hegelians, subscribes to a doctrine of internal relations, according to which relations are grounded in the intrinsic properties (or ‘natures’, to use Joachim’s word) of their terms. So the relations of the various parts are determined once the intrinsic properties are.

Bertrand Russell, in his critique of Joachim’s theory, argues that Joachim’s version of the coherence theory of truth entails and is entailed by the doctrine of internal relations:

It follows at once from [the doctrine of internal relations] that the whole of reality or of truth must be a significant whole in Mr. Joachim’s sense. For each part will have a nature which exhibits its relations to every other part and to the whole; hence, if the nature of any one part were completely known, the nature of the whole and of every other part would also be completely known; while conversely, if the nature of the whole were completely known, that would involve knowledge of its relations to each part, and therefore of the relations of each part to each other part, and therefore of the nature of each part. It is also evident that, if reality or truth is a significant whole in Mr. Joachim’s sense, the axiom of internal relations must be true. Hence the axiom is equivalent to the monist theory of truth. (Russell 1907, p. 140)

Russell’s argument is swift, but, when unpacked fully, can be shown to be valid (see Griffin 2008). Russell, of course, rejects the doctrine of internal relations, which he goes on to criticize at length, but he also has several other criticisms to make of the theory which are independent of the theory of relations.

One serious problem faced by all coherence theories of truth is that of eliminating the possibility of there being two distinct significant wholes, i.e., two competing, but equally coherent, systems of propositions, for then the theory would entail that there were two incompatible sets of truths. Joachim tries to avoid this by requiring that a significant whole which constitutes truth must have ‘absolutely self-contained significance’ (Joachim 1906, p. 78); he maintains that there can be only one such significant whole, the Absolute itself.

It is hardly certain that this follows, but, even if it does, the result is still problematic. If the Absolute is the only significant whole, then only what is part of the Absolute can be true. Now, as we have seen, Joachim (at least in his late work) rejects the ineffability with which Bradley shrouded the Absolute. And yet he also rejects the possibility that the significant wholes into which we compose our actual beliefs ever coincide exactly with the Absolute. It follows then—and Joachim accepts the implication—that all our actual beliefs are false. But he holds also that they are all, also, to some degree true, since each to some degree coheres with the others. This ‘degrees of truth’ doctrine is the expected, if somewhat counter-intuitive, consequence of a coherence theory of truth: since coherence comes in degrees, so, too, must truth (Joachim, 1948, pp. 262-3). It seems, then, that all our beliefs are more or less true, according as they form significant wholes which come more or less close to coinciding with the Absolute. This is certainly an intelligible view, but ultimately it does not look like a coherence theory: truth simpliciter consists in the coincidence of belief with the Absolute, and ‘coincidence’ here looks very much like another name for correspondence; coherence is merely a measure of verisimilitude, the degree to which beliefs approach coincidence with the Absolute.

Nor is it a theory which would have Bradley’s acceptance, for Bradley’s argument for the claim that it is logically impossible to doubt his account of the Absolute, rests on the claim that any idea ‘which seems hostile to our scheme ... [is] an element which really is contained within it’ (Bradley, 1893, p. 460), that the Absolute contains every possible ‘idea’. But if this is the case, then, on Joachim’s theory of truth, either all beliefs are absolutely true or else the Absolute is not absolutely coherent.

Joachim is thus faced with two problems: (i) the problem of accounting for error in a theory in which every belief is to some degree true; and (ii) the problem (as Joachim puts it, 1948, pp. 266-9) of deciding whether, given that the Absolute must be absolutely coherent, our beliefs are true because they are stages in an unending dialectical movement towards the Absolute or because they are part of the timelessly complete Absolute itself.

Joachim’s response to (i), in The Nature of Truth, is to claim that error consists in ‘an insistent belief in the completeness of my partial knowledge’ (1906, p. 144): ‘[t]he erring subject’s confident belief in the truth of his knowledge distinctively characterizes error, and converts a partial truth into falsity’ (ibid., p. 162). This is hardly satisfactory. Russell’s rebuttal is too brief and too amusing not to quote:

Now this view has one great merit, namely, that it makes error consist wholly and solely in rejection of the monistic theory of truth. As long as this theory is accepted, no judgment is an error; as soon as it is rejected, every judgment is an error.... If I affirm, with a ‘confident belief in the truth of my knowledge’, that Bishop Stubbs used to wear episcopal gaiters, that is an error; if a monistic philosopher, remembering that all finite truth is only partially true, affirms that Bishop Stubbs was hanged for murder, that is not an error. (Russell 1907, p. 135)

As regards (ii), in The Nature of Truth Joachim finds the problem insoluble: ‘We must be able to conceive the one significant whole, whose coherence is perfect truth, as a self-fulfilment, in which the finite, temporal, and contingent aspect receives its full recognition and its full solution as the manifestation of the timeless and complete’ (1906, p. 169). But ‘the demands just made cannot be completely satisfied by any metaphysical theory’ and we must recognize ‘that certain demands both must be and cannot be completely satisfied’ (p. 171). Moreover, as he goes on to point out, since the coherence theory cannot satisfy these demands, it cannot itself be coherent, and thus cannot be true (p. 176). This is a somewhat surprising end to his discussion.

In Logical Studies he is slightly, but only slightly, more sanguine. There, as we have seen, he appeals, over Bradley’s head, to the Hegelian dialectic to reconcile the timeless ideal with the temporal approximation. But how this effect is achieved he doesn’t say.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

The following list includes all Joachim’s philosophical writings.

i. Books

  • A Study of the Ethics of Spinoza (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1901).
  • The Nature of Truth (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1906).
  • De Lineis Insecabilibus (translation, with full footnotes) in The Works of Aristotle, ed. by W.D. Ross, vol. 6 (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1908.
  • Immediate Experience and Mediation. Inaugural Lecture. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1919).
  • De Generatione et Corruptione. (translation, with a few footnotes.) in The Works of Aristotle, ed. by W.D. Ross, vol. 2 (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1922).
  • Aristotle on Coming-to-be and Passing-away. A revised text of the De Generatione et Corruptione with introduction and commentary. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1922).
  • Spinoza’s Tractatus De Intellectus Emendatione: A Commentary (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1940).
  • Logical Studies, ed. by L.J. Beck (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1948).
  • Aristotle: The Nicomachean Ethics. A Commentary, ed. by D.A. Rees (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1951).
  • Descartes’ Rules for the Direction of the Mind, ed. by Errol Harris (London: Allen and Unwin, 1957).

ii. Articles

  • 1903. ‘Aristotle’s Conception of Chemical Combination’, The Journal of Philology, vol. 29, pp. 72-86.
  • 1905. ‘“Absolute” and “Relative” Truth’, Mind, vol. 14, n.s., pp. 1-14.
  • 1907. Review of Dr. S.R.T. Ross’s edition of Aristotle’s De Sensu et Memoria. (Text and Translation, with Introduction and Commentary: Cambridge University Press, 1906.) Mind, vol. 16, n.s., pp. 266-71.
  • 1907. ‘A Reply to Mr. Moore’, Mind, vol. 16, n.s., pp. 410-15.
  • 1909. ‘Psychical Process’, Mind, vol. 18, n.s., pp. 65-83.
  • 1911. ‘The Platonic Distinction between “True” and “False” Pleasures and Pains’, Philosophical Review, vol. 20, pp. 471-97.
  • 1914. ‘Some Preliminary Considerations on Self-Identity’, Mind, vol. 23, n.s., pp. 41-59.
  • 1919. ‘The “Correspondence-Notion” of Truth’, Mind, vol. 27, n.s., pp. 330-5.
  • 1920. ‘The Meaning of “Meaning”’ (Symposium), Mind, vol. 29, n.s., pp. 385-414.
  • 1927. ‘The Attempt to conceive the Absolute as a Spiritual Life’, The Journal of Philosophical Studies, vol. 2, pp. 137-52.
  • 1931. ‘“Concrete” and “Abstract” Identity’ (Letter), Mind, vol. 40, n.s., p. 533.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Blanshard, Brand (1980), ‘Autobiography’, in P.A. Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of Brand Blanshard (Chicago: Open Court), pp. 2-185.
  • Bradley, F.H. 1893, Appearance and Reality. A Metaphysical Essay (Oxford: Oxford University Press; 2nd edn., 9th impression, 1930).
    • The work which most strongly influenced Joachim’s philosophy.
  • Bradley, F.H. (1914), Essays on Truth and Reality (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Bradley, F.H. (1999) The Collected Works of F.H. Bradley, vols. 4 and 5, ed. by Carol A. Keene (Bristol: Thoemmes)
  • Contains Bradley’s letters to Joachim, but only one of Joachim’s to Bradley.
  • Connelly, James and Rabin, Paul (1996), ‘The Correspondence between Bertrand Russell and Harold Joachim’, Bradley Studies, 2, pp. 131-60.
    • Transcribes most of the extant correspondence between Joachim and Russell; most of it connected with the theory of truth.
  • Eliot, T.S. (1938), ‘Prof. H.H. Joachim’ The Times, 4 August 1938.
  • Eliot, T.S. (1964), ‘Preface’ to Eliot, Knowledge and Experience in the Philosophy of F.H. Bradley, (New York: Farrar, Straus).
    • This was Eliot’s Harvard doctoral dissertation completed in 1916 and written under Joachim’s supervision.
  • Eliot, T.S. (1988) The Letters of T.S. Eliot, vol. 1, 1898-1922, edited by Valerie Eliot (New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich).
    • Eliot’s letters from Oxford, especially to his former Harvard professor, J.H. Woods, contain much information about Joachim’s classes.
  • Griffin, Nicholas 2008, ‘Bertrand Russell and Harold Joachim’, Russell: The Journal of Bertrand Russell Studies, n.s. 27, pp.
    • A survey, biographical and philosophical, of Joachim’s relations with Russell, his most persistent critic.
  • Hampshire, Stuart (1951), Spinoza (Harmsworth: Penguin).
  • Joseph, H.W.B. (1938), ‘Harold Henry Joachim, 1868-1938’, Proceedings of the British Academy, 24 (1938), pp. 396-422.
    • The best published source for biographical information about Joachim.
  • Khatchadourian, Haig 1961, The Coherence Theory of Truth: A Critical Examination (Beirut: American University)
    • A careful critique of a number of coherence theories of truth, including Joachim’s.
  • Moore, G.E. (1907), ‘Mr. Joachim’s Nature of Truth’, Mind, n.s. 16 (1907), pp. 229-35.
    • Reply to The Nature of Truth.
  • Mure, G.R.G. (1961) ‘F.H. Bradley - Towards a Portrait’, Encounter, 16: pp. 28-35.
  • Mure, G.R.G. and Schofield, M.J. (2004), ‘Joachim, Harold Henry (1868-1938)’, Oxford Dictionary of National Biography (Oxford University Press).
  • Rabin, Paul (1997), ‘Harold Henry Joachim (1868-1938)’, presented at the Anglo-Idealism Conference, Oxford, July 1997.
    • A good compilation of biographical information about Joachim from various sources; unfortunately never published.
  • Russell, Bertrand (1906), ‘What is Truth?’, The Independent Review (June, 1906), pp. 349-53.
    • Review of Joachim’s The Nature of Truth.
  • Russell, Bertrand (1906a), ‘The Nature of Truth’, Mind, 15 (1906), pp. 528-33.
    • Reply to Joachim’s criticisms of Russell’s early identity theory of truth.
  • Russell, Bertrand, (1907) ‘The Monistic Theory of Truth’ in Russell’s Philosophical Essays (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1968; 1st edn. 1910), pp. 131-46.
    • The most important critique of Joachim’s coherence theory of truth.
  • Russell, Bertrand (1920), ‘The Wisdom of our Ancestors’, The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 9, Essays on Language, Mind and Matter, 1919-26, edited by John G. Slater (London: Unwin Hyman, 1988), pp. 403-6.
    • Review of Joachim’s inaugural lecture.
  • Vander Veer, Garrett L. 1970, Bradley’s Metaphysics and the Self (New Haven: Yale University Press), pp. 81-90.
    • An unusual discussion of Joachim as a critic of Bradley, based on the final pages of Logical Studies.
  • Walker, Ralph (2000), ‘Joachim on the Nature of Truth’ in W.J. Mander (ed.), Anglo-American Idealism, 1865-1927 (Westport, Ct.: Greenwood Press, 2000), pp. 183-97.
    • One of the few recent articles on Joachim’s coherence theory of truth.

Author Information

Nicholas Griffin
McMaster University

William Edward Burghardt Du Bois (1868—1963)

duboisW. E. B. Du Bois was an important American thinker: a poet, philosopher, economic historian, sociologist, and social critic. His work resists easy classification. This article focuses exclusively on Du Bois' contribution to philosophy; but the reader must keep in mind throughout that Du Bois is more than a philosopher; he is, for many, a great social leader. His extensive efforts all bend toward a common goal, the equality of colored people. His philosophy is significant today because it addresses what many would argue is the real world problem of white domination. So long as racist white privilege exists, and suppresses the dreams and the freedoms of human beings, so long will Du Bois be relevant as a thinker, for he, more than almost any other, employed thought in the service of exposing this privilege, and worked to eliminate it in the service of a greater humanity. Du Bois' pragmatist philosophy, as well as his other work, underlies and supports this larger social aim. Later in life, Du Bois turned to communism as the means to achieve equality. He envisioned communism as a society that promoted the well being of all its members, not simply a few. Du Bois came to believe that the economic condition of Africans and African-Americans was one of the primary modes of their oppression, and that a more equitable distribution of wealth, as advanced by Marx, was the remedy for the situation.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. General Philosophical Orientation
  3. Double Consciousness
  4. Second Sight
  5. Critique of White Imperialism
  6. Later Marxism
  7. Du Bois' Significance Today
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Du Bois was born in Great Barrington, Massachusetts, on February 23, 1868. He had a happy early childhood, largely unaware of race prejudice, until one day, as he records in Souls of Black Folk, a student in his class refused to exchange greeting cards with him simply because he was black (Souls, 2). This experience made Du Bois feel for the first time that he was different, in that he was both inside the white world (since he lived within it) and outside of it (since he was perceived in the white world through the lens of race prejudice). Throughout his life after this event, Du Bois was continually made to feel, as he says, that he was both an American and an African, but never an African-American, with his own distinct, coherent identity in the American world. "One ever feels his two-ness," he explains (Souls, 2).

Du Bois refused to become depressed by his new realization, and in fact made it his life's work to combat race prejudice and to find a way to achieve coherent personhood for blacks in America. Du Bois, it turns out, was just the right person for the job, since he had it in his character to affirm himself as a matter of course. He was a bold, courageous youth, willing to fight for himself and his peers. All his life Du Bois was self-assertive without being aggressive, assuming without hesitation the right to equality of all people.

Knowing his mission early on, Du Bois headed to school to become educated adequately to realize it (a task not without struggle in the virulently racist world of the times). He attended Fisk University as an undergraduate student and Harvard University as a graduate student as well as studied abroad in Germany. He was the first African-American to be awarded a Ph.D. from Harvard. At Harvard, he studied philosophy under William James, George Santayana, and Josiah Royce. Du Bois learned a lot from his philosophy teachers, especially James, but he came to reject academic philosophy, referring to it as "lovely but sterile" (Lewis, Biography 92). He turned to history and sociology instead.

Du Bois' dissertation reflects this new direction. It is entitled The Suppression of the African Slave Trade to the United States of America, 1638-1870. Du Bois began to turn his energies to a socio-economic analysis of the African-American situation. His efforts were guided by the belief that a proper understanding of this situation would help eliminate racism; if people only understood properly what African-Americans were going through, Du Bois felt, they would appreciate better the circumstances that they face and would work toward their full liberation and flourishing. This line of thought led to the publication of The Philadelphia Negro in 1899.

Du Bois' most important work, The Souls of Black Folk, was published in 1903, and reflects an important new direction of his thinking. This is the work for which he is most renowned, the work in which he declared, famously, that "the problem of the Twentieth Century is the problem of the color-line" (Souls, V). About this work, Du Bois' biographer writes, "It was one of those events epochally dividing history into a before and an after" (Lewis, Biography 277). What makes this work so important, culturally, is the way in which it speaks out passionately and uncompromisingly about the spirit of African-Americans, emphasizing their humanity and strength despite centuries of the worst oppression. In addition, Du Bois in this book dared to challenge the most famous African-American intellectual of the day, Booker T. Washington, and to assert an opposing principle to Washington's belief that industrial education alone would lead to equality. Du Bois argued instead that African-Americans must be given the chance to attain the most sophisticated, higher education as well, so that they might partake of the goods of civilization as well as be fit candidates to educate other African-Americans in turn (a task not to be left fully to whites).

The Souls of Black Folk is a work rich in philosophical content, as will be discussed in more detail below. For now, however, it should be noted that Du Bois shifts direction in this work and takes a novel approach from his previous work. Still trying to build understanding and sympathy for the situation of African-Americans, especially in the period after Reconstruction, Du Bois now combines socio-economic research with poetry, song, story, and philosophy. A new, multi-faceted voice grips Du Bois, allowing him, in what can only be called a great and profound piece of literature, to pierce the mind of his readers and to make them feel overwhelmingly the significance of being black in America.

In his middle works, most notably Darkwater, published in 1919, Du Bois changes directions again, as Manning Marable notes (Marable, vi). This time, instead of trying to make the reader gently understand, Du Bois lambastes the reader for failing to understand. Darkwater is a fiery, accosting work, in which Du Bois makes such claims as that "white Christianity is a miserable failure" because of its racism (Darkwater, 21), and that white civilization is to a large extent "mutilation and rape masquerading as culture" (Darkwater, 21). Du Bois' new approach consists of the attempt to wake up the reader from their racist slumber, to force them to see the racism wherever it is for what it is.

This work, in which Du Bois asserts that, "a belief in humanity is a belief in colored men" (Darkwater, 27), has become particularly important for later, critical race theory (see below). It is worth noting about the work for now that again Du Bois blends philosophy, poetry, literature, history, and sociology in a unique, energizing manner that was to remain his stylistic trademark.

Du Bois' later works include Dusk of Dawn (1940), his "autobiography of a concept of race." It also includes Black Folk, Then and Now: An Essay in the History and Sociology of the Negro Race (1939), in which he endorses a form of Marxist critique, and the posthumously published Autobiography of W. E. B. Du Bois (1968), which contains reflections on his life in its last decade.

Throughout his life, in addition to writing, Du Bois worked as an activist for social causes. He was editor of the journal, Crisis (1910-1919), which explored contemporary racial problems and how to combat them. He helped found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People (NAACP) as well as the Pan African Congress. He ran for the U.S. Senate in order to help improve the plight of African Americans. Later in life, as the chair of the Peace Information Center, he called for banishing atomic weapons and making them illegal (Lewis; Hynes).

In 1959, after a lifetime of combating rampant racism in the U.S., Du Bois had enough and expatriated to Ghana, Africa. He spent his time in Africa working on an Encyclopedia of African Peoples and refining his social analysis, which had come to include Marxist elements (he became an official member of the U.S. Communist Party before his departure). Du Bois died in Accra, Ghana, on August 27, 1963---immediately before the March on Washington that inaugurated the civil rights movement in America, as several commentators have observed (Lewis; Hynes).

2. General Philosophical Orientation

Philosophically speaking, Du Bois' work is difficult to characterize, since he lived and wrote for such a long time and refined his position over so many years. Eugene C. Holmes has described Du Bois as a materialist and a social philosopher (Holmes, 80-1). According to Holmes, "with Dr. Du was always the problem of getting the truth about race by means of a scientific approach" (Holmes, 77).

Recent scholarship has adopted a more nuanced perspective. Cornel West puts Du Bois decidedly in the camp of the pragmatists, that is, in the camp of someone who works in the "Emersonian tradition" of evading traditional philosophical problems altogether and turning instead to the empowerment of individuals and communities. What Du Bois adds to the pragmatists, according to West, is an impassioned and focused concern for "the wretched of the earth" and for thinking about how one can alleviate their plight (West, 138). Other more recent approaches tend to see Du Bois as a highly important critical theorist, or someone whose work is inherently and purposefully interdisciplinary in nature, drawing on multiple disciplines as needed to critique power, especially white power (Rabaka, 2). This view would seemed to be confirmed by Du Bois' biographer, who concludes his painstakingly thorough account of Du Bois' life and work by noting that Du Bois, in essence, "attempted virtually every possible solution to the problem of twentieth century racism---scholarship, communism" (Lewis, The Fight for Equality, 571). Hence, the traditional view of Du Bois as always concerned with getting at the truth about race through science would seem to be contradicted by recent scholarship, which holds that Du Bois tried multiple, irreconcilable approaches (even propaganda) to achieve his ends.

Even so, there remains important recent scholarship that sees Du Bois as a more traditional philosopher, concerned with the ideals of truth, goodness, and beauty. According to Keith Byerman, for example, Du Bois possesses "confidence in his grasp of truth," and his autobiographies, for one, are stories in which he always gains "a fuller view of truth" (Byerman, 7). The truth that Du Bois realizes, according to Byerman, is that there is a "Law of the Father," which "challenges the corrupt father... By supplanting the father, the son can install an "empire" of reason, morality, and beauty to replace arbitrary power and self-interest" (Byerman, 7-8). On this reading, which is Platonic in many ways, truth, goodness, and beauty are ideal qualities by appeal to which Du Bois judges and condemns the corrupt world of racial inequality.

Overall, then, we can see that the general interpretation of Du Bois' philosophy is contested ground, and that no clear-cut, agreed-upon definition of it emerges from the scholarship. Some Continental Philosophers have even identified Du Bois as Hegelian in a crucial respect (or at least as having "held out as ideal" one of Hegel's main goals) (Higgins, 58). The point is made that, like Hegel, the Du Boisian self is also torn asunder, divided within itself, only to have to struggle to attain a higher synthesis of identity in a new formation. Materialist, Pragmatist, Critical Theorist, Platonist, Hegelian---Du Bois' general philosophical orientation is far from having been finally determined.

3. Double Consciousness

Whatever turns out to be the best general account of Du Bois' philosophy, it seems the significance of his thought only really shows up in the specific details of his works themselves, especially in The Souls of Black Folk. It is here that he first develops his central philosophical concept, the concept of double consciousness, and spells out its full implications.

The aim of Souls of Black Folk is to show the spirit of black people in the United States: to show their humanity and the predicament that has confronted their humanity. Du Bois asserts that "the color line" divides people in the States, causes massive harm to its inhabitants, and ruins its own pretensions to democracy. He shows, in particular, how a veil has come to be put over African-Americans, so that others do not see them as they are; African-Americans are obscured in America; they cannot be seen clearly, but only through the lens of race prejudice. African-Americans feel this alien perception upon them but at the same time feel themselves as themselves, as their own with their own legitimate feelings and traditions. This dual self-perception is known as "double consciousness." Du Bois' aim in Souls is to explain this concept in more specific detail and to show how it adversely affects African-Americans. In the background of Souls is always also the moral import of its message, to the effect that the insertion of a veil on human beings is wrong and must be condemned on the grounds that it divides what otherwise would be a unique and coherent identity. Souls thus aims to make the reader understand, in effect, that African-Americans have a distinct cultural identity, one that must be acknowledged, respected, and enabled to flourish.

Souls contains a Forethought, fourteen chapters, and an Afterthought. Each chapter is preceded by a bar of African-American spiritual music coupled with a poem.

The Forethought tells us the plan of the work: to present "the spiritual world in which ten thousand Americans live and strive" (Souls, v). Chapter 1, "Of Our Spiritual Strivings," is perhaps the most important chapter of the book from a strictly philosophical perspective. Here Du Bois lays out the basic concept of double consciousness, while the remainder of the work provides concrete instances of the concept. The Afterthought, rich and powerful in poetic imagery, implores the reader not to let Du Bois' "leaves" fail to take root: it is an impassioned call to action based on the book's insights.

"An American, a Negro; two souls, two thoughts, two unreconciled strivings"---with these words from Chapter 1, Du Bois highlights the extreme tension involved in double consciousness (Souls, 2). Or, as he also expresses the point, "Why did God make me an outcast and a stranger in mine own house?" (Souls, 2). Double consciousness is the awareness of being a split person, a dual self whose different parts are at dire odds with one another. The American self in a person, such as America was then constituted, works against the Negro self; while the Negro self, resisting as it must such a constitution, works against the American self. In one person, therefore, we have two deeply divided tendencies.

Du Bois does not conceive this division to be a good thing; he conceives it, indeed, as positively unhealthy and problematic. He refers to it as "this waste of double aims, this seeking to satisfy two unreconciled ideals," which "has wrought sad havoc with the courage and faith and deeds of ten thousand people" (Souls, 3). Not knowing which particular direction to turn, always fighting against oneself in either direction, what double consciousness prevents is the attainment of "self-conscious manhood," a coherent sense of self and direction, the ability "to merge his double self into a better and truer self" (Souls, 2).

In Du Bois' conception, the human self is thus capable of being cut or split, and at the same time capable of growing back together again and becoming, as he says, better and even more true. Of course, a truer self implies something like truth---and thus we can see that Du Bois holds to the idea of a more genuine ideal of a person, specifically of African-Americans. Du Bois' idea is that African-Americans have in truth a unique, valuable identity but that current conditions keep this identity from forming or at least becoming fully active and available. We can see here, too, Du Bois' famous call for allowing African-Americans to become genuine participants in American culture, "to be a co-worker in the kingdom of culture" (Souls, 3), in such a way that American culture could only benefit by the inclusion of its own genuine members. Du Bois does not wish to eliminate white American culture nor Negro culture in America. He wishes to fuse the two into a genuine new element, "in order that some day on American soil two world-races may give each to each those characteristics both so sadly lack" (Souls, 7). Through recognition of a place for African-Americans in American culture, Du Bois wishes to achieve a genuine American culture as well: "the ideal of human brotherhood, gained through the unifying ideal of Race" (Souls, 7).

In the remaining chapters of Souls, Du Bois provides some rather powerful (and tragic) instances of the struggles with dual selfhood that African-Americans have had to undergo. A key idea of Chapter 1 is to show what Reconstruction meant for African-Americans: the chance not only to be free, and educated, and to have the vote, but more importantly (as Du Bois argues it) to become whole human beings. Chapter 2 examines the aftermath of Reconstruction and shows how Reconstruction (in the form of the Freedmen's Bureau) at first worked slowly toward, but then ultimately failed to achieve, this ideal. Chapter 3 continues to show how the ideal failed to develop by pointing to the slow and ineffective rise of leadership of African-Americans. It is in this chapter that Du Bois famously challenges Booker T. Washington for his call to lead blacks through industrial education without the inclusion of higher learning. How, Du Bois reasons, can African-Americans become "co-workers in the kingdom of culture" if they are only trained in the sterile practice of moneymaking? In Chapters 4 and 5, Du Bois takes his readers further into the idea of the veil, taking a look both inside it and outside in each chapter, respectively. By Chapter 6, we realize that the main problem in achieving coherent personhood for African-Americans is education. Chapters 7 and 8 outline the struggles that the masses of African-American workers, in particular, have undergone. Chapter 9 turns toward the present relations between African-Americans and white Americans. It focuses, in particular, on the manners and modes of segregation that keep the best of whites living apart from the best of African-Americans, thereby preventing a fruitful fusion of cultures. In Chapter 10, Du Bois purports to lift the veil, so that whites can see inside and especially appreciate the religious sense and striving of African Americans. He shows that the meaning of the religion is that it constitutes a special place where the kind of community and life for African-Americans can be attained that the white world denies them. Religion has had to become a refuge, but also at the same time a source of genuine freedom of expression and creativity. Chapter 11, which is very moving, recounts the birth (and loss) of Du Bois' own son as an instance of his own struggle against white culture. Here Du Bois laments that his newborn, innocent son will soon have to cross into the color line of hateful American prejudice. Chapters 12 and 13 discuss the struggles that great African-American souls had to deal with to become more fully appreciated, including a narrative about a man named John who defended his sister against dishonor only to be met with horrible racism as a result. Chapter 14, the last chapter, closes with a rich discussion of African-American music in which Du Bois points to this music as an emblem of the possible brighter future in which African-Americans become co-workers in American culture. Such music is the symbol of this better future in which African-Americans contribute to the culture since it is, after all, he claims, the only genuinely beautiful music that has come out of America to date, and reveals what African-Americans can accomplish.

Thus, Du Bois provides us with multiple instances of double consciousness. In each case, African-Americans are shown to be struggling to achieve themselves, due to the enforced divisions and roadblocks of white culture. What Du Bois presents here are short, powerful looks at the struggle to be recognized as fully human, a struggle due to the horrible crime of racism. The concept of double consciousness plays itself out in a variety of ways---from the agonizing worry a father feels in raising his son in a white world to the failed policies of segregation and the creation of ghettos in American cities---always with the same devastating effect, the compromising of identity, and yet with a new identity that is forming and emerging. The African-American is forced to struggle to be him- or herself in America, Du Bois shows, but they have done so heroically and with deep humanity throughout their plight.

Some Du Bois interpreters (Higgins) have found parallels between Du Bois' conception of double consciousness and Nietzsche's conception of the free spirit, or the man who stands apart. The idea is that in both cases someone within the culture is at the same time able to stand outside of it. But as we have seen above, beyond this general notion, Du Bois clearly develops his concept of double consciousness in the context of African-Americans specifically. Nor does he favor this sense of division in the way that Nietzsche sometimes seems to do but rather he actively seeks to overcome it.

The overall implication of Souls is that such enforced separation of consciousness as occurs in the case of African-Americans is wrong; it violates something fundamental about the human condition, and it ruins our republic, by preventing us from forming the best use of our talents by drawing on the strengths of all races. We must work together to attain a greater sense of personhood for the members of our culture.

4. Second Sight

Du Bois' other major philosophical concept is that of "second sight." This is a concept he develops most precisely in Darkwater, a work, as we have seen, in which Du Bois changes his approach and takes up a stauncher stance against white culture.

Du Bois holds that due to their double consciousness, African-Americans possess a privileged epistemological perspective. Both inside the white world and outside of it, African-Americans are able to understand the white world, while yet perceiving it from a different perspective, namely that of an outsider as well.

The white person in America, by contrast, contains but a single consciousness and perspective, for he or she is a member of a dominant culture, with its own racial and cultural norms asserted as absolute. The white person looks out from themselves and sees only their own world reflected back upon them---a kind of blindness or singular sight possesses them. Luckily, as Du Bois makes clear, the dual perspective of African-Americans can be used to grasp the essence of whiteness and to expose it, in the multiple senses of the word "expose." That is to say, second sight allows an African-American to bring the white view out into the open, to lay it bare, and to let it wither for the problematic and wrong-headed concept that it is. The destruction of "whiteness" in this way leaves whites open to the experience of African-Americans, as a privileged perspective, and hence it also leaves African-Americans with a breach in the culture through which they could enter with their legitimate, and legitimating, perspectives.

5. Critique of White Imperialism

In a particularly important essay of Dark Water, called "The Souls of White Folk," Du Bois reveals some of the wisdom of his race's privileged perspective. As Du Bois sees it, whites see themselves a certain way, namely as superior, civilized, perfect, beneficent, and called upon to help other peoples with their higher wisdom. But, in truth, as African-Americans can perceive quite plainly, whites are actually imperialistic, ugly, greedy, and corrupt in their practices. Whites are imprisoned in their own false self-conception. Their own seriousness with themselves contrasts sharply with the reality that African-Americans see. What they see, above all, is that white society consists not of higher wisdom but only of "mutilation and rape masquerading as culture" (Darkwater, 21).

Du Bois makes his claims more pointed and specific by noting that the concept of "whiteness" is what we might today call a social construct. It is a concept that developed in the late nineteenth century and in the twentieth century. Before that, various societies hardly made much of differences in skin color. What is significant about this fact is that it shows whiteness as a category to emerge simultaneously with the development of industrialism and its counterpart colonialism. Western peoples wanted the material resources of the third world, and so they invented the myth of their own superiority based on skin color, and the supposed inferiority of dark peoples, in order to assist them in their desire to steal.

Based on such maneuvers as these, the third world was conquered, dark peoples were murdered, raped, and exploited, and white culture became rich. This wealth and power in turn gave whites a sense of superiority. But this sense of superiority is undone by the tragic-comic self-conception whites have of themselves as superior simply because they are white, when in fact they are bound to a false, invented self-conception based on color, one that only serves to assist in murder and exploitation. The supposedly civilized concept of "whiteness" in truth sinks into barbarism and insatiable world conquest.

And it is this, precisely, that whites cannot see about themselves, but must learn to see, if the problem of the twentieth century, the problem of the color line, is to be overcome and the races are to create together a greater and truer democracy.

6. Later Marxism

Later in life, Du Bois turned to communism as the means to achieve equality. As he put it in his autobiography, "I now state my conclusion frankly and clearly: I believe in communism. I mean by communism, a planned way of life in the production of wealth and work designed for building a state whose object is the highest welfare of its people and not merely the profit of a part" (Autobiography, 57). Du Bois came to believe that the economic condition of Africans and African-Americans was one of the primary modes of their oppression, and that a more equitable distribution of wealth, as advanced by Marx, was the remedy to the situation.

Du Bois was not simply a follower of Marx, however. He also added keen insights to the communist tradition himself. One of his contributions is his insistence that communism contains no explicit means of liberating Africans and African-Americans, but that it ought to focus its attentions here and work toward this end. "The darker races," to use Du Bois' language, amount to the majority of the world's proletariat. Without their liberation and motive force in the production of communism, it cannot be achieved. In Black Folk, Then and Now, Du Bois writes: "the dark workers of Asia, Africa, the islands of the sea, and South and Central America...these are the one who are supporting a superstructure of wealth, luxury, and extravagance. It is the rise of these people that is the rise of the world" (Black Folk, 383).

A further contribution Du Bois makes is to show how Utopian politics such as communism is possible in the first place. Building on Engle's claim that freedom lies in the acknowledgment of necessity, as Maynard Solomon argues (Solomon, "Introduction" 258), (because in grasping necessity we accurately perceive what areas of life are open to free action), Du Bois insists on the power of dreams. Admitting our bound nature (bound to our bellies, bound to material conditions), even stressing it, he nonetheless emphasizes our range of powers within these constraints. In a lecture called "The Nature of Intellectual Freedom" that he delivered to the Cultural and Scientific Conference for World Peace in 1949, using language that anticipates Jean-Paul Sartre, Du Bois calls attention to "the upsurging emotions," the mind's ability to go beyond what is present (259). Also like Sartre, Du Bois attempts to employ this power behalf of socialism. As Du Bois sees it, the human mind has the ability to take flight into "infinite freedoms" ("The Nature," 259). This "upsurging" ability of mind is vital to bringing about socialism, for it allows us to dream of what life and social conditions might be as compared to what they currently are (Solomon, "Introduction," 258). If properly cultivated, it allows us to see beyond the supposed necessity of the capitalist system, which everywhere presents itself, falsely, as the only way. Imagination surpasses untruth.

There is, as Du Bois points out ("The Nature," 260), and Solomon confirms (Solomon, "Introduction," 258), a "borderland" region in which compulsion and freedom meet. We must gain food, seek shelter, and raise our children. Necessity and liberty meet each other half way in this region, each pulling in their own direction, yet oftentimes working together. Our leaders take advantage of this region. They enforce necessity to work hard and to work in order to eat---in order, ultimately, to stifle individual freedom and its meanderings, its free decisions; and they promote ignorance of conditions in order to make us more beholden to them. However, there is hope in the fact that freedom also operates in this border region and that our minds can shape a part of what occurs in this region. Socialism must focus here and nurture this hope. It must promote, above all, "the dreaming of dreams by untwisted souls," that our dreams might someday lead to better realities ("The Nature," 260).

7. Du Bois' Significance Today

Although difficult to characterize in general terms, Du Bois' philosophy amounts to a programmatic shift away from abstraction and toward engaged, social criticism. In affecting this change in philosophy, especially on behalf of African-Americans and pertaining to the issue of race, Du Bois adds concrete significance and urgent application to American Pragmatism, as Cornel West maintains, a philosophy that is about social criticism, not about grasping absolute timeless truth.

Du Bois' work has also been essential for Africana Critical Theory, and has influenced a host of thinkers in this tradition, as Rabaka has shown. Authors have often compared Du Bois' work to that of Frantz Fanon in its call to overcome global race prejudice and to liberate Africa. In addition, Du Bois' philosophy was a focus point for some of the work of Dr. Martin Luther King, Jr., among many other thinkers, who praised it highly for its commitment to truth about African-American experience and history (Rabaka, 35).

Du Bois' philosophy has also contributed significantly to critical race theory, especially his article, "The Conservation of Races," in which Du Bois argues, echoing Souls, that there is some real meaning to race, even if it is difficult precisely to define (Conservation, 84-85). As Robert Bernasconi makes clear, Du Bois is a central figure in the debate about the nature of race because he has triggered an intense discussion about the extent to which there is a biological basis to race and the extent to which social and cultural features define race as well ("Introduction," 1-2).

With his concept of second sight, and the privileged perspective of minorities, Du Bois also anticipates, if not single handedly creates, Standpoint Theory in epistemology, which holds that minorities are better equipped to gain knowledge about the world than members of the dominant culture. Du Bois' social philosophy also adds an important element to Marxism by focusing on the racial elements of oppression and their function in relation to class warfare. Moreover, his philosophy also anticipates certain French Feminists, such as Luce Irigaray, who demonstrate how culture mirrors back to us the image of our selves to the detriment of minorities.

Above all, however, Du Bois' philosophy is significant today because it addresses what many would argue is the real world problem of white domination. So long as racist white privilege exists, and suppresses the dreams and the freedoms of human beings, so long will Du Bois be relevant as a thinker, for he, more than almost any other, employed thought in the service of exposing this privilege, and worked to eliminate it in the service of a greater humanity.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bernasconi, Robert. "Introduction," in Race, ed. Robert Bernasconi (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2001).
  • Byerman, Keith E. Seizing the Word: History, Art, and Self in the Work of W. E. B. Du Bois (Athens: University of Georgia Press, 1994).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Black Folk, Then and Now (Millwood, N.Y.: Kraus-Thomson Organization Limited, 1975).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Darkwater: Voices From Within the Veil (Mineola, N. Y. Dover Publications, 1999).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Dusk of Dawn: An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept (New York: Schocken Books, 1968).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Autobiography of W. E. B. Du Bois: A Soliloquy on Viewing My Life from the Last Decade of its First Century (New York: International Publishers, 1980).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Conservation of Races," in Race, ed. Robert Bernasconi (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2001).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Nature of Intellectual Freedom," in Solomon, Maynard, ed., Marxism and Art: Essays Classic and Contemporary (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Souls of Black Folk (New York: Dover Publications, 1994).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Talented Tenth." 3/13/2006. <>.
  • Harding, Sandra. The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader: Intellectual and Political Controversies (London: Routledge, 2003).
  • Higgins, Kathleen. "Double Consciousness and Second Sight," in Critical Affinities: Nietzsche and African American Thought, ed., Jacqueline Scott and A. Todd Franklin (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2006).
  • Holmes, Eugene C. "W. E. B. Du Bois: Philosopher," in Black Titan: W. E. B. Du Bois (Boston: Beacon Press, 1970).
  • Hynes, Gerald C. "A Biographical Sketch of W. E. B. Du Bois." 3/10/2006. http://www.
  • Irigaray, Luce. Speculum of the Other Woman. Trans. Gillian G. Gill (New York: Cornell University Press, 1974).
  • Lewis, David Levering. W. E. B. Du Bois: Biography of a Race: 1868-1919 (New York: Henry Holt, 1993).
  • Lewis, David Levering. W. E. B. Du Bois: The Fight for Equality and the American Century: 1919-1963 (New York: Henry Holt, 2000).
  • Marable, Manning, "Introduction," Darkwater: Voices From Within the Veil. By W. E. B. Du Bois (Mineola, N. Y. Dover Publications, 1999), v-viii.
  • Marable, Manning. W.E.B. Du Bois: Black Radical Democrat (Boulder, Colorado: Paradigm Publishers, 2005).
  • Rabaka, Reiland. W. E. B. Du Bois and the Problems of the Twenty-First Century: An Essay on Africana Critical Theory (Lanham, MD.: Lexington Books, 2007).
  • Solomon, Maynard, "Introduction," in Marxism and Art: Essays Classic and Contemporary, Ed., Maynard Solomon (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • West, Cornel. The American Evasion of Philosophy: A Genealogy of Pragmatism (Madison, WI: The University of Wisconsin Press, 1989).

Author Information

Donald J. Morse
Webster University
U. S. A.

Mozi (Mo-tzu, c. 400s—300s B.C.E.)

moziMo Di (Mo Ti), better known as Mozi (Mo-tzu) or "Master Mo," was a Chinese thinker active from the late 5th to the early 4th centuries B.C.E. He is best remembered for being the first major intellectual rival to Confucius and his followers. Mozi's teaching is summed up in ten theses extensively argued for in the text that bears his name, although he himself is unlikely to have been its author. The most famous of these theses is the injunction that one ought to be concerned for the welfare of people in a spirit of "impartial concern" (jian'ai) that does not make distinctions between self and other, associates and strangers, a doctrine often described more simplistically as "universal love." Mozi founded a quasi-religious and paramilitary community that, apart from propagating the ten theses, lent aid to small states under threat from military aggressors with their expertise in counter-siege technology. Along with the Confucians, the Mohists were one of the two most prominent schools of thought during the Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.), although contemporary sources such as the Hanfeizi and the Zhuangzi indicate that the Mohists had divided into rival sects by this time. While Mohist communities probably did not survive into the Qin dynasty (221-206 B.C.E.), Mohist ideas exerted a decisive influence upon the thinkers of early China. Between the late 4th and late 3rd centuries B.C.E., later Mohists wrote the earliest extant Chinese treatise on logic, as well as works on geometry, optics and mechanics. Mohist logic appears to have influenced the argumentative techniques of early Chinese thinkers, while Mohist visions of meritocracy and the public good helped to shape the political philosophies and policy decisions of both the Qin and Han (202 B.C.E.-220 C.E.) imperial regimes. In these ways, Mohist ideas survived well into the early imperial era, albeit by being absorbed into other Chinese philosophical traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. The Core Chapters of the Mozi
  3. The Ten Core Theses of Mohism
  4. The Aims and Character of Mohist Doctrine
  5. Moral Epistemology
  6. The Foundations of Mohist Morality
  7. Impartial Concern
  8. Moral Psychology and Human Nature
  9. Government
  10. Frugality
  11. Just War
  12. Heaven and Spirits
  13. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

The details of Mozi's life are uncertain.  Early sources identify him variously as a contemporary of Confucius or as living after Confucius' time.  Modern scholars generally believe that Mozi was active from the late 5th to the early 4th centuries B.C.E., before the time of the Confucian philosopher Mencius, which places him in the early Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.) of ancient Chinese history.  Little can be known of his personal life.  Some early sources say that he, like Confucius, was a native of the state of Lu (in modern Shandong) and at one point served as a minister in the state of Song (in modern Henan). According to tradition, he studied with Confucian teachers but later rebelled against their ideas.  As was the case with Confucius, Mozi probably traveled among the various contending states to present his ideas before their rulers in the hope of obtaining political employment, with an equal lack of success.

Mozi founded a highly organized quasi-religious and military community, with considerable geographical reach.  Overseen by a "Grand Master" (juzi), members of the community -- "Mohists" (mozhe) -- were characterized by their commitment to ten theses ascribed to "Our Teacher Master Mo" (zimozi), versions of which are articulated in the "Core Chapters" of the eponymous text.  Quite apart from propagating the teachings of Mozi, the Mohist community also functioned as an international rescue organization that dispatched members versed in the arts of defensive military techniques to the aid of small states under threat from military aggressors. This outreach presumably stemmed from the Mohists' opposition to all forms of military aggression.

Some scholars speculate that Mozi and the Mohists probably came from a lower social class than, for instance, the Confucians, but the evidence is inconclusive and at best suggestive. Nevertheless, if the conjecture is true, it could well explain the often repetitive and artless style in which much of the Mozi is composed and the anti-aristocratic stance of much Mohist doctrine, as well as why the Mohists paid such attention to the basic economic livelihood of the common people.

2. The Core Chapters of the Mozi

The text known as the Mozi traditionally is divided into seventy-one "chapters," some of which are marked "missing" in the received text. Most scholars believe that the Mozi was probably not written by Master Mo himself, but by successive groups of disciples and their followers. No part of the text actually claims to be written by Mozi, although many parts purport to record his doctrines and conversations.

While there remain intense and complicated scholarly disputes over the exact dating and provenance of different parts of the Mohist corpus, it is probable that chapters 8-37 (the so-called "core chapters") derive either from the teachings of Mozi himself or from the formative period of the Mohist community and contain doctrines that were nominally adhered to by its members throughout much of the community's existence. The core chapters are replete with the formula "the doctrine of Our Teacher Master Mo says" (zimozi yan yue), prefixed to sayings presented as records of Master Mo's teaching.  (However, since the text most likely was not written by Mozi himself, this entry will refer to the doctrine presented in the core chapters in terms of "the Mohists" and "Mohist doctrine" rather than "Mozi" and "Mozi's doctrine.")

The core chapters consist of ten triads of essays, with seven chapters marked "missing." Each triad of chapters correlates with one of the ten Mohist theses.  Traditionally, these triads correspond to the "upper" (shang), "middle" (zhong) and "lower" (xia) versions of the thesis in question; in Western scholarship, they are usually referred to as versions "A," "B," and "C" of the corresponding thesis.  Intriguingly, the chapters that make up each triad often are very close to each other in wording without being exactly identical, thus raising questions about the precise relationship between them and with how the text assumed its present shape. One influential theory in recent times is Angus C. Graham's proposal that the triads correspond to oral traditions of Mohist doctrine transmitted by the three Mohist sects mentioned in the Hanfeizi, a third century B.C.E. philosophical text associated with a student of the Confucian thinker Xunzi.

Much of the core chapters is written in a style that is not calculated to please.  As Burton Watson puts it, the style is "marked by a singular monotony of sentence pattern, and a lack of wit or grace that is atypical of Chinese literature in general."  But Watson also concedes that the Mohists' arguments "are almost always presented in an orderly and lucid, if not logically convincing fashion." Whether or not the arguments of the core chapters are logically convincing can only be determined on a case-by-case basis, but it is at least possible that the artless style is the consequence of a deliberate choice to prioritize clarity of argumentation.

3. The Ten Core Theses of Mohism

The contents of the ten triads and thus the outlines of the ten core theses are briefly described below:

Chapters 8-10, "Elevating the Worthy" (shangxian), argue that the policy of elevating worthy and capable people to office in government whatever their social origin is a fundamental principle of good governance.  The proper implementation of such a policy requires that the rulers attract the talented to service by the conferring of honor, the reward of wealth and the delegation of responsibility (and thus power). On the other hand, the rulers' practice of appointing kinsmen and favorites to office without regard to their abilities is condemned.

Chapters 11-13, "Exalting Unity" (shangtong), contain a state-of-nature argument on the basis of which it is concluded that a unified conception of what is morally right (yi) consistently enforced by a hierarchy of rulers and leaders is a necessary condition for social and political order. The thesis applies to the world community as a whole, conceived as a single moral-political hierarchy with the common people at the bottom, the feudal princes in the middle, and the emperor at the summit, above whom is Heaven itself.

Chapters 14-16, "Impartial Concern" (jian'ai), argue that the cause of the world's troubles lies in people's tendency to act out of a greater regard for their own welfare than that of others, and that of associates over that of strangers, with the consequence that they often have no qualms about benefiting themselves or their own associates at the expense of others. The conclusion is that people ought to be concerned for the welfare of others without making distinctions between self, associates and strangers.

Chapters 17-19, "Against Military Aggression" (feigong), condemn military aggression as both unprofitable (even for the aggressors) and immoral. Version C introduces a distinction between justified and unjustified warfare, claiming that the former was waged by the righteous ancient sage rulers to overthrow evil tyrants.

Chapters 20-21 (22 is listed as "missing"), "Frugality in Expenditures" (jieyong), argue that good governance requires thrift in the ruler's expenditures. Useless luxuries are condemned. The chapters also argue for the clear priority of functionality over form in the making of various human artifacts (clothing, buildings, armor and weapons, boats and other vehicles).

Chapter 25 (23-24 are listed as "missing"), "Frugality in Funerals" (jiezang), has the same theme as "Frugality in Expenditures," but applies it to the specific case of funeral rituals. The aristocratic practices of elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning are condemned as "not morally right" (buyi) because they are not only useless to solving the world's problems, but add to the people's burdens.  Here, the Mohists target practices beloved by their Confucian contemporaries, for whom the maintenance of harmonious moral order in society is best accomplished through strict fidelity to ritual codes.

Chapters 26-28, "Heaven's Will" (Tianzhi), argue that the will of Heaven (Tian) -- portrayed as if it is a personal deity and providential agent who rewards the good and punishes the wicked -- is the criterion of what is morally right.  Here again, the Mohists contrast themselves with the Confucians, who regard Heaven as a moral but mysterious force that does not intervene directly in human affairs.

Chapter 31 (29-30 are listed as "missing"), "Elucidating the Spirits" (minggui), claims that a loss of belief in the existence, power and providential character of spirits -- supernatural agents of Tian tasked with enforcing its sanctions -- has led to widespread immorality and social and political chaos. The chapter consists of an exchange with certain skeptics, whom Mozi answers with arguments purporting to prove that providential spirits exist, but also that widespread belief in their existence brings great social and political benefit.

Chapter 32 (33-34 are listed as "missing"), "Against Music" (feiyue), condemns the musical displays of the aristocracy as immoralon the same basis according to which elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning are condemned in "Frugality in Funerals."  Just as in that chapter, here again the Mohists attack practices that are particularly dear to their Confucian rivals, who believe that music, if properly performed according to ancient canons, can play a vital role in the regulation of moral order and the cultivation of virtue.

Chapters 35-37, "Against Fatalism" (feiming), argue against the doctrine of fatalism (the thesis that human wisdom and effort have no effect on the outcomes of human endeavor) as pernicious and harmful in that widespread belief in it will lead to indolence and chaos. The chapters also contain crucial discussions on the general conditions or criteria (traditionally called the "Three Tests of Doctrine") that must be met by any doctrine if it is to be considered sound. (See Section 5: "Moral Epistemology" below.)

4. The Aims and Character of Mohist Doctrine

As in the case of many other philosophical conceptions in early China, Mohist doctrine is deeply rooted in the thinkers' response to the social and political problems that are perceived to beset the world (tianxia, "all beneath Heaven").  In particular, the Mohists are concerned to offer a practical solution to the chaos (luan) of the world so as to restore it to good order (zhi). A way to characterize the Mohists' concern is to say that they (like many early Chinese philosophers) seek and to put the Way (dao, the right way to live and to conduct the community's affairs) into practice rather than merely to discover and state the Truth about the universe. But there are also several more distinctively Mohist twists to this underlying concern.

First, the Mohists tend to equate the Way with a conception of what is morally right (yi or renyi ). For them, good order obtains when "right rules" (yizheng) rather than "might rules" (lizheng) in the world, and "right rules" when agents (both individual and groups) conduct themselves in a manner that is morally right. A way by which we might make sense of the Mohists' project is to see it as concerned with promoting the public good, where the public good is defined in terms of social and political justice.

Second, Mohist doctrine is almost exclusively concerned with moral behavior rather than moral character  although, to be more precise, the main object of moral evaluation in Mohist doctrine is usually a way of conduct (for the individual) or a policy (for the state), rather than individual acts. In line with this focus on behavior, concepts that are naturally understood to be virtues or desirable qualities of agents (e.g., benevolence and filial piety) in Confucian texts often are discussed as if they are reducible to the moral rightness of conduct. In "Frugality in Funerals," for instance, "the business of the filial son" is defined in terms of conduct that benefits the world, which is in turn, a criterion of moral rightness (see the next section).

Third, the Mohists see the morally right as conceptually distinct from the customary or traditional. An argument that appeals to the distinction can be found in "Frugality in Funerals."  The Mohists point to the variety between burial customs among the tribal peoples on the periphery of the Chinese world and note that, although what the tribes practice is customary within their communities, these practices also are all understood by an elite Chinese audience to be barbaric and immoral.  The Mohists thus urge that, just because elaborate funerals and lengthy mourning are customary practices among the gentlemen of the central states, this fact alone will not secure their consistency with moral rightness.

Fourth, for the Mohists, the Way is the subject of explicit expression in the form of "doctrine" (yan).  Before proceeding with this point, it must be stressed that the term yan in the core chapters and other texts contemporary to the period ( the Mencius for instance) is often not best taken as "language" or "speech" in any generic sense. Rather, it often means "doctrine" or "maxim of conduct," a verbal package meant to guide individual conduct and state policy. In other words, we can take yan in the core chapters as the verbal counterpart to a conception of the Way, a linguistic formula that identifies a Way of life and guiding the conduct of those who hold to it.

Not only are Mozi and the Mohists concerned to advance a Way, they are explicit in verbalizing their Way as doctrine, offering arguments for it and defending it against rival doctrines. In disputation, they often first formulate their rivals' positions as opposing doctrines before attempting to refute them.  They also often identify rivals by the doctrines they supposedly "hold to" (for instance, they speak of "the doctrine of those who hold to [the thesis that] ("fate exists'" in "Against Fatalism").  There is even a tendency to see the problematic conduct of people as largely springing from wrong doctrine, quite apart from the concern to offer arguments against various opponent positions. In addition, when the Mohists evaluate a practice or way of conduct, they sometimes speak in terms of evaluating the doctrinethat (putatively) corresponds to that practice (see, for instance, "Frugality in Funerals").

The "Ten Theses" as a whole can thus be taken as presenting the sum of Mohist doctrine, which is itself the verbal or linguistic counterpart to their Way, their conception of what is morally right. The characteristically Mohist tendency to see the Way as open to linguistic formulation puts them in sharp contrast with "Daoist" traditions such as those associated with Laozi and Zhuangzi. In fact, as Robert Eno has argued, the Mohist focus on doctrine very likely forms the polemical background to the critique against language in texts such as the "Discourse on Making Things Equal" chapter in the Zhuangzi.

5. Moral Epistemology

One of the philosophically most interesting aspects of the Mohist concern with doctrine is their explicit discussion of criteria for evaluating doctrine in the "Against Fatalism" chapters.  The "Three Tests of Doctrine" are introduced as the "standards" or "gnomons" (yi) without which doctrinal disputes become futile. As version C puts it: "To expound doctrine without first establishing standards (yi) is like telling time using a sundial that has been placed on a spinning potter's wheel."  The consequence is that the dispute will be interminable.

Although each version of "Against Fatalism" lists three "Tests," the lists differ and a total of four distinct "Tests" can be identified:

  1. Conformity to the Will of Heaven and the Spirits -- this criterion is mentioned only in "Against Fatalism" B but forms the subject matter of the "Heaven's Will" chapters. In those chapters, we can also find the claim that Heaven's will is to Mozi like as "the compass is to a wheelwright or the setsquare is to a carpenter."  Just as the wheelwright and carpenter use these tools to evaluate if some object is properly considered round or square, so Mozi is said to lay down Heaven's will as a model (fa) and establish it as a standard (yi) by which conduct and doctrines can be evaluated.
  2. Conformity to the teaching and practice of the ancient sage kings -- Varieties of this "Test" are reported in all versions of "Against Fatalism" and its application can be seen throughout the core chapters.
  3. Good consequences for the welfare of the world (especially the material wellbeing of the common people understood in terms of them having food, shelter and rest) --  Varieties of this "Test" are also reported in all versions of "Against Fatalism" and a lengthy elaboration can also be found in "Frugality in Funerals."
  4. Confirmation by the testimony of the masses' sense of sight and hearing -- This "Test" is listed in "Against Fatalism" A and C, and there are only two certain applications" in the core chapters: in the "Elucidating Ghosts" chapter as part of the proof that providential ghosts exist, and in "Against Fatalism" B as part of the argument against the doctrine of fatalism.

There seems to be a widespread temptation to construe the different "Tests" in the following way: if a doctrine (yan) passes a "Test," it is true. On this interpretation, the third "Test" might suggest a pragmatic conception of truth (or at least a pragmatic conception of the justification of truth claims).  But such a reading is at best underdetermined by the text. It is also unnecessary as long as we keep in mind that the sort of yan at stake in the Core Chapters is usually such doctrine as is meant to guide conduct.

With that background in mind, we can at least see the first three "Tests" as being meant precisely for evaluating such yan as are naturally evaluated in terms of whether they correctly guide human conduct, rather than whether they make a true factual claim.  This means that these "Tests" are best taken as criteria for assessing the soundness of normative rather than descriptive claims.  Now given that Mohist doctrine is meant to be the verbal correlate of their conception of the Way, which in turn can be taken as their conception of what is morally right, it follows that "sound doctrine" in the context of Mohist thought is ultimately doctrine that enjoins morally right conduct and in this specific sense correctly guides human conduct. This also implies that each of these "Tests" can be understood as a criterion for moral rightness.

As for the fourth "Test," while it seems natural to take it as a criterion for evaluating factual, rather than normative claims, it should still be kept in mind that the Mohists appear to be primarily interested in the normative or policy implications of the (putatively factual) claims involved.

6. The Foundations of Mohist Morality

An intriguing question concerns how the different "Tests of Doctrine" (and thus the criterion of moral rightness to which each corresponds) relate to each other and whether any among them is the ultimate criterion to which the others can be reduced.

Of the three main "Tests," the second one (conformity to the teaching and practice of the ancient sage kings), is most easily shown to be derivative. The core chapters define the sage (and the related "benevolent man," which means roughly "ideal ruler" in context) as someone whose business it is to bring about order to the world ("Impartial Concern" A) or to promote the world's welfare and eliminate things that harm it ("Impartial Concern" B, C, "Frugality in Funerals," "Against Music"). In "Heaven's Will," on the other hand, the ancient sages are cited as examples of those who conducted themselves in accordance with Heaven's will. In summary, the ancient sages are presented by the Mohists as widely acknowledged exemplars of past rulers who successfully conducted themselves according to the Way, and the very reason why they are acknowledged to be sage kings is precisely because they taught sound doctrine and practiced the Way.

Given the wider cultural setting and prevailing rhetorical conventions, the Mohists' extensive appeal to the example and authority of the ancient sages is entirely understandable. Whatever their actual attitudes concerning the deeds and writings of the ancient sages as constituting a criterion of sound doctrine, the Mohists present themselves as addressing people who take the moral example of the ancient sages seriously. In this, their rhetorical practices do not differ from those of the Confucians. The two groups even share an overlapping taste in their choice of favored ancient sages: Yao, Shun, Yu, Tang, Wen, and Wu.

This leaves Heaven's Will and good consequences for the welfare of the world as criteria of sound doctrine. There is a strong tradition of modern interpreters, such as Fung Yu-lan, Angus C. Graham, and Benjamin Schwartz, who see the latter as primary and take Mohist doctrine to exemplify a form of utilitarianism. Other scholars, such as Dennis M. Ahren, David E. Soles, and Augustine Tseu, see the former as suggesting a divine command theory of morality, although this interpretation has been criticized by Kristopher Duda among others.  This controversy is not well framed if it is stated purely in terms of the modern and somewhat alien categories of command theory and utilitarianism (or consequentialism). But this criticism aside, the genuine question remains as to how "Heaven's Will" and "good consequences" relate to each other as criteria of the morally right.

In favor of the position that the criterion of good consequences is ultimate, it may be pointed out that even within the "Heaven's Will" chapters, the Mohists argue on the basis that certain ways of conduct are in accordance with Heaven's Will because they promote the public good. It is further claimed that Heaven desires that people do certain sorts of things or conduct themselves in a certain manner because such conduct will promote the public good, an outcome that Heaven desires. These considerations suggest that the criterion of Heaven's Will might ultimately be reducible to that of good consequences.

In response, it is at least possible that while the question what ways of conduct are morally right? is always answerable in terms of whether or not a way of conduct promotes good consequences, the separate question of why these ways of conduct (picked out using the criterion of good consequences) are ultimately obligatory is answered with reference to Heaven's Will.  If this is right, then there is a sense in which the two criteria neither reduce to each other nor potentially conflict, as they answer to different concerns altogether.

In any case, almost all of the Mohists' proposals are explicitly defended on the basis that adopting them will promote the public good. We might thus modestly conclude that whatever the final status of Heaven's Will as a criterion of the morally right, good consequences for the world is the operational criterion by which the Mohists evaluate various doctrines and the ways of conduct they verbalize.  This conclusion is lent further support by the fact that Heaven's Will almost never features as an explicit part of the Mohists' arguments for their specific proposals outside of the "Heaven's Will" chapters.

7. Impartial Concern

Whether "Heaven's will" or "good consequences for the world" forms the ultimate criterion of the morally right, the most salient first-order ethical injunction in Mohist doctrine remains that of "impartial concern" (jian'ai).  This is an injunction that is argued for both on the basis that it exemplifies Heaven's Will (in the "Heaven's Will" triad) and that it is conducive to the order and welfare of the world (in the "Impartial Concern" triad). In addition, the presentation of the doctrine (in all versions of "Impartial Concern") strongly suggests that it is meant to be the panacea for all that is seriously wrong with the world and, to that extent, identifies the main substance of the Mohists' Way.

As earlier indicated, "impartial concern" might be stated as the injunction that people ought to be concerned for the welfare of others without making distinctions between self and others, associates and strangers. Scrutiny of the core chapters, however, suggests both more and less stringent interpretations of what it entails by way of conduct. At one extreme, the injunction seems to require that people ought (to seek) to benefit strangers as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves. At the other extreme, it only requires that people refrain from harming strangers as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves. A third, intermediate possibility says that people ought (to seek) to help strangers with urgent needs as much as they do associates, and others, as much as they do themselves.

The least stringent interpretation is implied by passages (in all versions of "Impartial Concern") where the injunction is argued for on the basis that adopting it will put a stop to the violent inter-personal and inter-group conflicts that beset the world, since on the Mohist account, it is people's tendency to act on the basis of a greater regard for their own welfare over that of others, and that of their associates over that of strangers, that led them to have no qualms about benefiting themselves or their own associates at the expense of others and even to do so using violent means. The injunction of "impartial concern" is meant to be a reversal of this tendency. On the other hand, the more demanding interpretations are suggested especially by "Impartial Concern C," in which it is said that if the doctrine is adopted b people, then not only will people not fight, the welfare of the weak and disadvantaged will be taken care of by those better endowed.

Whichever interpretation is taken, the basic injunction points toward an underlying notion of impartiality. We can take "impartial concern" as making explicit the notion that the common benefit of the world is, in some sense, impartially the benefit of everyone.

In "Impartial Concern" C, the Mohists put forward an interesting thought experiment ostensibly to show that even people who are committed to being more concerned for the welfare of self that for that of others, and associates than strangers have some reason to value impartial concern. They described a scenario in which the audience is asked to imagine that they are about to go on a long journey and need to put their family members in the care of another.  The Mohists claim that the obvious and rational choice would be to put one's family members in the care of an impartialist rather than a partialist (that is, someone who is committed to "impartial concern" as opposed to someone who is committed to the opposite).

There are several problems with this argument. It seems to involve a false dilemma since the options of impartialist and partialist hardly exhaust the range of possible choices.  Even if the Mohists were correct to claim that the impartialist is the obvious and rational choice, all it shows is that partialists have good reason to prefer that other people conduct themselves according to the dictates of impartial concern, rather than that they have reason to so conduct themselves, as Chad Hansen and Bryan W. Van Norden have pointed out.  In defense of the Mohists, however, it might be the case that they are ultimately only concerned to establish that even partialists have reason to propagate the Mohists' doctrine of impartial concern, a conclusion that could follow from their argument.

8. Moral Psychology and Human Nature

Mohist doctrine as it is presented in the core chapters does not contain explicit discussions of the psychological aspects of the ethical life.  "Human nature" (xing), a term that plays an important role in the thinking of the Confucian thinkers Mencius and Xunzi, as well as Yang Zhu, does not even appear in the core chapters. Nonetheless, various aspects of Mohist doctrine might well entail commitments to potentially controversial positions in moral psychology and the theory of human nature.

Consider the Mohists' reply to the main objection raised against their doctrine of "impartial concern" -- that the doctrine is overly demanding, given that people in general just do not have the motivational resources to act according to its dictates ("Impartial Concern" B and C). Citing historical accounts, the Mohists respond that the requirements of "impartial concern" are no harder than the sorts of things that rulers in the past had been able to demand and get from their subjects, such as reducing one's diet, wearing coarse clothing, and charging into flames at the ruler's command. It was because the rulers delighted in such actions and offered suitable incentives to encourage them that they were done, even on a regular basis. The Mohists conclude that people in general can be made to practice "impartial concern" as long as rulers delight in it and offer the right incentives to encourage it.

On the basis of passages such as this one, David S. Nivison and Bryan W. Van Norden argue that either the Mohists held the view that human nature is infinitely malleable or they thought that there is no human nature. Such a reading focuses on the extravagant claim made in the text that as long as the rulers delight in "impartial concern" and offer the right incentives, human beings (especially the structure of their motivations) can be radically changed "within a single generation."  While this interpretation certainly is compatible with the tenor of the text, it is not necessarily the only possible interpretation.  After all, all that is needed for the Mohists to make their reply is the thought that people -- given their nature -- can be made to practice "impartial concern" through offering them the right leadership and incentives. They hardly need the stronger (and less plausible) claim that people can be remolded in any fashion whatsoever given the right leadership and incentives. Furthermore, at least some of the historical examples cited by the Mohists suggest that they are thinking more of the people responding to incentives in the environment (e.g., the comfort-loving courtier wearing coarse clothing or going on a diet so as to please the ruler) rather than more radical changes to the structure of their motivations (as might be suggested by the story of the soldiers who have been conditioned to charge into flames on the ruler's command).

A weaker and to that extent more defensible interpretation is that the Mohists do not consider the Way in a Mencian sense -- as "the realization of certain inclinations that human beings already share," as Shun Kwong-loi puts it. To be more precise, the Mohists do not appear to have considered the inclinations and predispositions that people already have as pointing to the contents of the Way. But they need not deny that these inclinations might, under suitable conditions (e.g., under a suitable regime of incentives), furnish the motivational resources for an agent to conduct himself well (the "Mohist" Yi Zhi in Mencius 3A5 seems to have taken a version of such a position) -- as long as it is recalled that what counts as "conducting oneself well" is given by something else other than those inclinations or their development: sound doctrine established by rational arguments. Seen this way, the Mohists would be in direct opposition to Mencius, insofar as Mencius regards those "inclinations that human beings already share" (explicitly construed within the context of an account of human nature) as providing both the contents of morality and the motivational resources for moral cultivation.

9. Government

The Mohists' political ideal is most prominently stated in the "Elevating the Worthy" and "Exalting Unity" chapters, which include the only theses that are explicitly said to identify "fundamentals of governance" (wei zheng zhi ben).

The "Exalting Unity" triad of chapters contains a "state of nature" argument that bears comparison both with ideas found in the Confucian philosopher Xunzi and perhaps more remotely, Thomas Hobbes' Leviathan and the social contract tradition of early modern European thought. As with the latter, it is at least arguable that even though the account is couched as if making historical claims about how human beings were like in a distant past "before there were any laws and criminal punishment" (version A) or "before there were rulers or leaders" (versions B and C), its logic is better appreciated if taken as a thought experiment of what things would be like were certain hypothetical conditions to hold.

The most important implications of such a hypothesis, for the Mohists, is that people will hold to different and conflicting opinions about what is morally right (yi), on the basis of which they will condemn each other. The end result is a state of violent conflict and chaos. This chaos is fully resolved only with the installment of a hierarchy of rulers and leaders consistently enforcing a unified conception of what is morally right through surveillance and incentives. The conclusion of the argument is that such a solution is a necessary condition for social and political order.

The "Elevating the Worthy" triad of chapters, on the other hand, proposes that good governance requires that the state cultivate worthy and capable people and employ them as officials, whatever their social origin. This doctrine opposes a form of meritocracy to the nepotism and cronyism prevalent among the rulers. It also insists that if the doctrine is to be successfully carried though, the rulers need to confer high rank, generous stipend and real power upon the worthy. Interestingly, in arguing for the doctrine, version B both traces it to the practices of the ancient sage kings and also says that the ancients were modeling their regime upon Heaven, thus suggesting that an application of the criterion of "Heaven's will" in involved. Nonetheless, the main thrust of all three versions remains that meritocracy will bring great benefits to the state.

10. Frugality

Three of the ten core Mohist theses are related to the virtue of frugality: "Frugality in Expenditures," "Frugality in Funerals," and "Against Music."  For the most part, the arguments in these chapters are paradigmatic cases of "good consequences to the welfare of the world" as criterion of the morally right. (As mentioned earlier, a lengthy elaboration of the criterion can be found in the opening parts of "Frugality in Funerals.") In "Frugality in Expenditures," the criterion is applied positively through showing that the preferred policy of government thrift brings about beneficial consequences. In the other two triads, the criterion is applied negatively through detailing the harmful consequences that attend elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning, and extravagant music displays of the aristocracy.

One interesting feature of the arguments in these chapters is the weight given to the welfare of the common people in the Mohists' calculation of the benefit and harm that result from the policy under assessment. This aspect of Mohist doctrine is especially prominent in "Against Music," where a large part of what counts as the "good consequences" of a policy is articulated in terms of the common people receiving enough to eat, being protected from the elements and having sufficient rest. It thus seems that, despite their commitment to "impartial concern," the Mohists have a partisan concern for the interests of the lower social classes. The more charitable interpretation, however, is that they are accommodating concerns in the region of distributive justice. That is, the common benefit of the world is in some sense impartially and equally the benefit of everyone; but since the Mohists -- like most thinkers in ancient China -- do not envision a radical elimination of the vast social, economic and political inequalities that are simply a fact of life in Warring States China, the distributive concerns are met by giving extra weight to the interests of the disadvantaged. This reading is also consonant with their claim that were "impartial concern" to be widely practice, the welfare of the weak and disadvantaged will be taken care of by those better endowed (in "Impartial Concern C").

A more serious charge against the Mohists, however, is that their doctrine on frugality commits them to an overly restrictive and hence highly implausible conception of the good. The Confucian thinker Xunzi defends elaborate Confucian funeral rituals and musical displays against Mohist attacks by claiming that they given form to, and meet, the emotional needs of people. Conversely, Mohist doctrine simply fails to take into account aspects of the human good not reducible to material livelihood. Insofar as Mohist doctrine does imply such a reduced conception of the human good, this is a cogent objection.

But insofar as the main weight of the Mohist arguments lies in the thought that it is unjust of the aristocrats to provide for their own emotional needs (through elaborate funerals and prolonged mourning) or refined enjoyment (though elaborate musical displays) through an imposition upon the labor of the common people, the objection is not decisive. Interestingly enough, that this what the Mohists have in mind is indicated in "Against Music." The text apologizes for attacking the aristocracy's musical displays by conceding that while music and other refinements are "delightful," they bring no benefit to the common people and, in fact, harm their livelihood.

11. Just War

The Mohists reserved some of their most trenchant condemnations against military aggression, asserting that offensive war is harmful to the welfare of the world and contrary to Heaven's will. One argument (two variations of which can be found in "Against Military Aggression" A and "Heaven's Will" C) proceeds by claiming that there is an analogy between the actions of a military aggressor and those of people who steal or rob others or who murder. And since (as even the audience agrees) stealing, robbing and murdering are morally wrong, and since actions that cause greater harm to others are, to that extent, greater wrongs, military aggression is a great wrong indeed.

Another series of arguments (in "Against Military Aggression" B and C) proceeds by pointing out in some detail the economic and human cost of military aggression even to the aggressors. To the reply that some of the Warring States appear to have greatly profited from their aggressive ways, the Mohists point out that they are the rare exceptions and seeking profit by such means is tantamount to calling a medication effective that cured four or five out of myriads.

Perhaps as befits the difference in addressee, the second set of arguments appears more pragmatic as it appeals to the "war-loving" rulers' sense of self-interest. The earlier argument, on the other hand, appears to aim showing the gentlemen of the world that they ought to condemn military aggression if they are to be consistent with their own normative convictions -- if they know that stealing, robbing and murdering is wrong and blameworthy, they ought also to consider military aggression wrong and blameworthy.

The objection is raised in "Against Military Aggression" C that the ancient sage kings waged war, and since they are supposed to be models of moral rectitude, it follows that war cannot be unqualifiedly wrong. In response, the Mohists introduce a distinction between justified and unjustified warfare, claiming that the former was waged by the righteous ancient sage rulers to overthrow evil tyrants. The precise criterion of the distinction between the two forms of warfare, however, is not explicitly spelled out in that chapter. Instead, justified warfare is associated with supernatural signs indicating that Heaven has given the ruler a mandate to wage war so as to visit condign punishment upon some wicked tyrant. This is surprising since elsewhere ("Impartial Concern" C), the Mohists present the sage Yu's military campaigns to pacify the unruly Miao tribes as an example of his "impartial concern" for the welfare of the people of the world. This suggests that there are ample resources within Mohist doctrine to spell out the distinction in less exotic terms. But since they did connect the distinction between justified and unjustified warfare to Heaven and the spirits, a discussion of the Mohists' religious views is in order.

12. Heaven and Spirits

Within the core chapters, the Mohists consistently portray Heaven as if it possesses personal characteristics and exists separately from human beings, though intervening in their affairs. In particular, they present Heaven if it is an entity having will and desire, and concerned about the welfare of the people of the world, even a providential agent that rewards the just and punishes the wicked through its control of natural phenomena or by means of its superhuman intermediaries, the spirits (guishen). Finally, Heaven and the spirits are also portrayed as the objects of reverence, sacrificial offerings and supplication ("Heaven's Will" B).

Apart from the earlier mentioned role of Heaven's will in providing a criterion for what is morally right, the Mohists also blame people's loss of belief in the existence, power and providential character of spirits for the perceived immorality and chaos of their time. This motivates them to argue that such spirits do exist in "Elucidating the Spirits."  But the Mohists' considered position with regards to the existence of providential spirits as opposed to the usefulness of a widespread belief in their existence is an ambiguous one at best. While the first parts of "Elucidating the Spirits" seem aimed at establishing that the spirits exist (by appealing to the testimony of people sense of sight and hearing), the bulk of the arguments in the chapter are better taken as attempts to show that it is socially and politically beneficial that people in general believe in the existence of providential spirits and that the government organize its affairs on the basis that they exist. As the text puts it:

If the fact that ghosts and spirits reward the worthy and punish the evil can be made a cornerstone of policy in the state and impressed upon the common people, it will provide a means to bring order to the state and benefit to the people.

In this regard, an argument that appears towards the end of the chapter is most telling. To the objection that the doctrine on spirits entails the need to sacrifice to them, which in turn interferes with one's duties towards one's living parents, the Mohists reply that if the spirits do exist, then the sacrifices cannot be considered a waste of resources; but if they do not exist, then the community can still come together to share in the communion of the sacrificial wine and millet and the sacrifice will still serve a socially useful function. The argument implies that what the Mohists are ultimately concerned to argue for is neutral with respect to whether or not providential spirits actually exist, as the author and Benjamin Wong have pointed out.

13. References and Further Reading

  • Ahern, Dennis M. "Is Mo Tzu a Utilitarian?" Journal of Chinese Philosophy 3 (1976): 185-193.
  • Duda, Kristopher. "Reconsidering Mo Tzu on the Foundations of Morality." Asian Philosophy 11/1 (2001): 23-31.
  • Fung Yu-lan. A History of Chinese Philosophy. 2 vols. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1952-53.
  • Graham, Angus C. Divisions in Early Mohism Reflected in the Core Chapters of Mo-tzu. Singapore: Institute of East Asian Philosophies, 1985.
  • Graham, Angus C. Later Mohist Logic, Ethics, and Science. Hong Kong: Chinese University Press / London: School of Oriental and African Studies, 1978; reprinted 2003.
  • Hansen, Chad. A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought: A Philosophical Interpretation. New York: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Hsiao Kung-chuan. A History of Chinese Political Thought, Vol. 1: From the Beginnings to the Sixth Century A. D. Trans. F. W. Mote. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979.
  • Hu Shih. The Development of the Logical Method in Ancient China. 2nd edition. New York: Paragon Book Reprint Corp., 1963.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. "Mohist Philosophy."  In Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed.  Edward Craig (London and New York: Routledge, 1998), 6:451-458.
  • Knoblock, John, trans.  Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works. 3 vols. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1988-94.
  • Lai, Whalen. "The Public Good that does the Public Good: A New Reading of Mohism." Asian Philosophy 3/2 (1993): 125-141.
  • Lowe, Scott. Mo Tzu's Religious Blueprint for a Chinese Utopia: The Will and the Way. Ontario: Edwin Mellen Press, 1992.
  • Loy, Hui-chieh. "On a Gedankenexperiment in the Mozi Core Chapters." Oriens Extremus 45 (2005): 141-158.
  • Maeder, Erik W. "Some Observations on the Composition of the €˜Core Chapters' of the Mozi." Early China 17 (1992): 27-82.
  • Mei, Yi-pao. Mo-tse, the Neglected Rival of Confucius. London: Arthur Probsthain, 1934.
  • Mei, Yi-pao. The Ethical and Political Works of Motse. London: Arthur Probsthain, 1929.
  • Nivison, David S. The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Bryan W. Van Norden. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1996.
  • Pines, Yuri. Foundations of Confucian Thought: Intellectual life in the Chunqiu Period, 722-453 B.C.E. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2002.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin. The World of Thought in Ancient China. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1985.
  • Shaughnessy, Edward L., and Michael Loewe, eds. The Cambridge History of Ancient China: From the Beginnings of Civilization to 221 b.c. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. Mencius and Early Chinese Thought. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
  • Soles, David E. "Mo Tzu and the foundations of Morality." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 26/1 (1999): 37-48.
  • Taylor, Rodney L. "Religion and utilitarianism: Mo Tzu on spirits and funerals." Philosophy East and West 29/3 (July 1979): 337-346.
  • Tseu, Augustine. The Moral Philosophy of Mozi. Taipei: China Printing Limited, 1965.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W. "A Response to the Mohist Arguments in €˜Impartial Caring.'"  In The Moral Circle and the Self: Chinese and Western Approaches, eds. Kim-chong Chong, Sor-Hoon Tan and C. L. Ten (Chicago: Open Court, 2003), 41-58.
  • Vorenkamp, Dirck. "Another Look at Utilitarianism in Mo Tzu's Thought." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 19 (1992): 423-443.
  • Watson, Burton, trans. Mo Tzu: Basic Writings. Columbia University Press, 1963.
  • Wong, Benjamin, and Hui-chieh Loy. "War and Ghosts in Mozi's Political Philosophy." Philosophy East and West 54/3 (2004): 343­-363.
  • Wong, David B. "Mohism: The Founder, Mozi (Mo Tzu)."  In Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. Antonio S. Cua (London and New York: Routledge, 2003), 453-461.
  • Wong, David B.  "Universalism versus Love with Distinctions: An Ancient Debate Revived." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 16/3-4 (September-December 1989): 251-272.
  • Yates, Robin D.S. "The Mohists on Warfare: Technology, Technique, and Justification." Journal of the AmericanAcademy of Religion 47 (1979): 549-603.

Author Information

Hui-chieh Loy
National University of Singapore

Modern Chinese Philosophy

The term “modern Chinese philosophy” is used here to denote various Chinese philosophical trends in the short period between the implementation of the constitutional “new policy” (1901) and the abolition of the traditional examination system (1905) in the late Qing (Ch’ing) dynasty and the rise and fall of the Republic of China in mainland China (1911-1949). As an ancient cultural entity, China seemed to be frozen in a time capsule for thousands of years until it suddenly defrosted as a direct result of military invasions and exploitation by the West and Japan since the Opium War of 1839-42. Thus, one may argue that China had longer “classical” and “medieval” periods than the West, whereas its “modern” period began relatively recently. Modern Chinese philosophy is rooted historically in the traditions of Buddhism, Confucianism, especially Neo-Confucianism, and the Xixue (“Western Learning,” that is, mathematics, natural sciences and Christianity) that arose during the late Ming Dynasty (ca. 1552-1634) and flourished until the early Republic Period (1911-1923). In particular, the Jingxue (School of Classical Studies), or classical Confucianism, developed in the early Qing dynasty, which critiqued Neo-Confucian thought as impractical and subjective and instead championed a pragmatic approach to resolving China’s dilemmas as a nation, exerting a powerful influence on the development of modern Chinese philosophy. Modern Chinese philosophers typically responded to critiques of their heritage by both Chinese and Western thinkers either by transforming Chinese tradition (as in the efforts of Zhang Zhidong and Sun Yat-sen), defending it (as in the work of traditional Buddhists and Confucians), or opposing it altogether (as in the legacy of the May Fourth New Cultural Movement, including both its liberal and its communist exponents). Many modern Chinese philosophers advanced some form of political philosophy that simultaneously promoted Chinese national confidence while problematizing China’s cultural and intellectual traditions. In spite of this, a striking feature of most modern Chinese philosophy is its retrieval of traditional Chinese thought as a resource for addressing 20th century concerns.

Table of Contents

  1. Dividing Chinese Philosophy into Periods
  2. Historical Background
  3. The Transformational Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Zhang Zhidong
    2. Sun Yat-sen
    3. Chinese Scholasticism
  4. The Anti-Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Yan Fu and Western Learning
    2. The May Fourth New Cultural Movement
    3. Hu Shi
    4. Chen Duxiu
    5. The Debate of 1923
  5. The Traditional Trend in Modern Chinese Philosophy
    1. Yang Rensan and the Buddhist Renaissance
    2. Ou-Yang Jingwu and the Chinese Academy of Buddhism
    3. Liang Shuming and Neo-Confucianism
    4. Fung Yulan and Neo-Confucianism
    5. Carsun Chang and Neo-Confucianism
    6. Xiong Shili and Neo-Confucianism
    7. Wang Kuowei and Classical Confucianism
    8. Thome Fang and Classical Confucianism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Dividing Chinese Philosophy into Periods

The term “modern Chinese philosophy” is used here to denote various Chinese philosophical trends in the short period between the implementation of the constitutional “new policy” (1901) and the abolition of the traditional examination system (1905) in the late Qing Dynasty and the rise and fall of the Republic of China in mainland China (1911-1949). Admittedly, the term “modern philosophy” often refers to Western philosophy since the 17th century , characterized by the critical and independent spirit inspired by the Scientific Revolution, but there is no counterpart to this movement in 17th-19th century Chinese intellectual history. As an antique, independent cultural entity, China seemed to be frozen in a time capsule for thousands of years until it suddenly defrosted as a direct result of military invasions and exploitation by the West and Japan since the Opium War of 1839-42. Thus, one may argue that China had longer “classical” and “medieval” periods than the West, whereas its “modern” period began relatively recently.

With this demarcation in mind, the history of Chinese philosophy can be divided into five phases: the ancient (ca. 1000 BCE-588 CE), the medieval (589-959 CE), the Renaissance (960-1900 CE), the modern (1901-1949 CE), and the contemporary (after 1949 CE). Roughly speaking, many parallels to the history of Western philosophy can be discerned in this division. Like Greek philosophy, ancient Chinese philosophy was dominated by a spirit of fundamental humanism rather than theistic enthusiasm. Like Christian scholasticism, medieval Chinese philosophy was dominated by a religious concern displayed in the teachings of the multifarious Buddhist schools. The Renaissance of Chinese philosophy may be found in the Neo-Confucian movement that lasted for one thousand years through four dynasties: the Song (960-1279), Yuan (1280-1367), Ming (1368-1643) and Qing (1644-1911). Finally, all schools of modern and contemporary Western thought have prompted modern and contemporary Chinese philosophy to respond to their profound challenges. These various modes of response include the affirmation of tradition, the transformation of tradition, and the abandonment of tradition, once and for all. Collectively, these three modes of response function as the background to the development of modern Chinese philosophy and also help identify three of its major trends: the transformational trend (represented by Zhang Zhidong and Sun Yat-sen), the traditional trend (represented by traditional Buddhism, classical Confucianism, and