Category Archives: Philosophical Traditions

Daoist Philosophy

daoismAlong with Confucianism, “Daoism” (sometimes called "Taoism") is one of the two great indigenous philosophical traditions of China. As an English term, Daoism corresponds to both Daojia (“Dao family” or “school of the Dao”), an early Han dynasty (c. 100s BCE) term which describes so-called “philosophical” texts and thinkers such as Laozi and Zhuangzi, and Daojiao (“teaching of the Dao”), which describes various so-called  “religious” movements dating from the late Han dynasty (c. 100s CE) onward.  Thus, “Daoism” encompasses thought and practice that sometimes are viewed as “philosophical,” as “religious,” or as a combination of both.  While modern scholars, especially those in the West, have been preoccupied with classifying Daoist material as either “philosophical” or “religious,” historically Daoists themselves have been uninterested in such categories and dichotomies.  Instead, they have preferred to focus on understanding the nature of reality, increasing their longevity, ordering life morally, practicing rulership, and regulating consciousness and diet.  Fundamental Daoist ideas and concerns include wuwei (“effortless action”), ziran (“naturalness”), how to become a shengren (“sage”) or zhenren (“realized person”), and the ineffable, mysterious Dao (“Way”) itself.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Daoism?
  2. Classical Sources for Our Understanding of Daoism
  3. Is Daoism a Philosophy or a Religion?
  4. The Daodejing
  5. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing
  6. The Zhuangzi
  7. Basic Concepts in the Zhuangzi
  8. Daoism and Confucianism
  9. Daoism in the Han
  10. Celestial Masters Daoism
  11. Neo-Daoism
  12. Shangqing and Lingbao Daoist Movements
  13. Tang Daoism
  14. The Three Teachings
  15. The "Destruction" of Daoism
  16. References and Further Reading

1. What is Daoism?

Strictly speaking there was no Daoism before the literati of the Han dynasty (c. 200 BCE) tried to organize the writings and ideas that represented the major intellectual alternatives available. The name daojia, "Dao family" or "school of the dao was a creation of the historian Sima Tan (d. 110 BCE) in his Shi ji (Records of the Historian) written in the 2nd century BCE and later completed by his son, Sima Qian (145-186 BCE). In his classification, the Daoists are listed as one of the Six Schools: Yin-Yang, Confucian, Mohist, Legalist, School of Names, and Daoists. So, Daoism was a retroactive grouping of ideas and writings which were already at least one to two centuries old, and which may or may not have been ancestral to various post-classical religious movements, all self-identified as daojiao ("teaching of the dao"), beginning with the reception of revelations from the deified Laozi by the Celestial Masters (Tianshi) lineage founder, Zhang Daoling, in 142 CE. This entry privileges the formative influence of early texts, such as the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, but accepts contemporary Daoists' assertion of continuity between classical and post-classical, "philosophical" and "religious" movements and texts.

2. Classical Sources for Our Understanding of Daoism

Daoism does not name a tradition constituted by a founding thinker, even though the common belief is that a teacher named Laozi founded the school and wrote its major work, called the Daodejing, also sometimes known as the Laozi. The tradition is also called "Lao-Zhuang" philosophy, referring to what are commonly regarded as its two classical and most influential texts: the Daodejing or Laozi (3rd Cent. BCE) and the Zhuangzi (4th-3rd Cent BCE). However, this stream of thought existed in an oral form, passed along by the masters who developed and transmitted it before it came to be written in these texts. There are two major source issues to be considered. 1) What evidence is there for Daoist beliefs and practices prior to the two classical texts? 2) What is the best reconstruction of the classical textual tradition upon which Daoism was based?

With regard to the first question, Isabelle Robinet thinks that the classical texts are only the most lasting evidence of a movement she associates with a set of writings called the Songs of Chu (Chuci), and that she identifies as the Chuci movement. This movement reflects a culture in which male and female masters called fangshi, daoshi, or daoren practiced techniques of longevity and used diet, meditation and generated wisdom teachings. While Robinet's interpretation is controversial, there are undeniable connections between the Songs of Chu and later Daoist ideas. Some examples include a coincidence of names of immortals (sages), a commitment to the pursuit of physical immortality, a belief in the epistemic value of stillness and quietude, abstinence from grains, breathing and sexual practices used to regulate internal energy (qi), and the use of dances that resemble those still done by Daoist masters (the step of Yu).

In addition to the controversial connection to the Songs of Chu, the Guanzi (350-250 BCE) is a text older than both the Daodejing and probably all of the Zhuangzi, except the "inner chapters" (see below). This is a very important work of 76 "chapters." Three of the chapters of the Guanzi are called the Neiye, which can mean "inner cultivation." The self-cultivation practices and teachings put forward in this material may be fruitfully linked to several other important works: the Daodejing; the Zhuangzi; a Han dynasty Daoist work called the Huainanzi; and an early commentary on the Daodejing called the Xiang'er. Indeed, there is a strong meditative trend in the Daoism of late imperial China known as the "inner alchemy" tradition and the views of the Neiye seem to be in the background of this movement. Two other chapters of the Guanzi are called Xin shu (Heart-mind book). The Xin shu connects the ideas of quietude and stillness found in the Daodejing to longevity practices. The idea of dao in these chapters is very much like that of the Daodejing. Its image of the sage resembles that of the Zhuangzi. It uses the same term (zheng) that Zhuangzi uses for the corrections a sage must make in his body, the pacification of the heart-mind, and the concentration and control of internal energy (qi). These practices are called "holding onto the One," "keeping the One," "obtaining the One," all of which are phrases associated with the Daodejing (chs. 10, 22, 39).

As for a reasonable reconstruction of the textual tradition upon which Daoism is based, we should not try to think of this task so simply as determining the relationship between the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi as though they were not composite. Zhuangzi repeats in very similar form sayings found in the Daodejing. However, we are not certain whether this means that Zhuangzi knew the Daodejing and quoted it, or if they both drew from a common source, or even if the Daodejing in some way depended on the Zhuangzi. In fact, one theory about the mythological figure Laozi is that he was created first in the Zhuangzi and later associated with the Daodejing.

We could offer the following summary of the sources of early Daoism. Stage One: Zhuang Zhou's "inner chapters" (chs. 1-7) of the Zhuangzi (c. 350 BCE) and some components of the Guanzi, including perhaps both the Neiye and the Xin shu. Stage Two: Some parts of the "mixed chapters" (chs. 23-33) of the Zhuangzi and the final redaction of the Daodejing. Stage Three: the Huang-Lao manuscripts from Mawangdui (see below); the "outer chapters" (8-22) of the Zhuangzi, and the Huainanzi (180-122 BCE).

3. Is Daoism a Philosophy or a Religion?

In the late 1970s Western and comparative philosophers began to point out that an important dimension of the historical context of Daoism was being overlooked because the previous generation of scholars had ignored or even disparaged connections between the classical texts and Daoist religious belief and practice. We have to lay some of the responsibility for such neglect at the feet of the eminent translator and philosopher Wing-Tsit Chan, who spoke of Daoist religion as a degeneration of Daoist philosophy arising from the time of the Celestial Masters (see below) in the late Han period. He was an instrumental architect of the view that Daoist philosophy (daojia) and Daoist religion (daojiao) are entirely different traditions.

Our interest in trying to separate philosophy and religion in Daoism is more revealing of the Western frame of reference we use than of Daoism itself. Daoist ideas fermented among master teachers who had a holistic view of life. These daoshi (Daoist masters) did not compartmentalize practices by which they sought to influence the forces of reality, increase their longevity, have interaction with realities not apparent to our normal way of seeing things, and order life morally and by rulership. They offered insights we might call philosophical aphorisms. But they also practiced meditation and physical exercises, studied nature for diet and remedy, practiced rituals related to their view that reality had many layers and forms with whom/which humans could interact, led small communities, and advised rulers on all these subjects. The masters transmitted their teachings, some of them only to disciples and adepts, but gradually these became more widely available as is evidenced in the very creation of the Daodejing and Zhuangzi themselves.

The agenda that provoked Westerners to separate philosophy and religion, dating at least to the classical Greek period of philosophy was not part of the preoccupation of Daoists. Accordingly, the question whether Daoism is a philosophy or a religion is not one we can ask without imposing a set of understandings, presuppositions, and qualifications that do not apply to Daoism. But this is not a reason to discount the importance of Daoist thought. Quite to the contrary, it may be one of the most significant ideas classical Daoism can contribute to the study of philosophy in the present age.

4. The Daodejing

The Daodejing (hereafter, DDJ) is divided into 81 "chapters" consisting of slightly over 5,000 Chinese characters, depending on which text is used. In its received form from Wang Bi (see below), the two major divisions of the text are the dao jing (chs. 1-37) and the de jing (chs. 38-81). Actually, this division probably rests on little else than the fact that the principal concept opening Chapter 1 is dao (way) and that of Chapter 38 is de (virtue). The text is a collection of short aphorisms that were not arranged to develop any systematic argument. The long standing tradition about the authorship of the text is that the "founder" of Daoism, known as Laozi gave it to Yin Xi, the guardian of the pass through the mountains that he used to go from China to the West. But the text is a composite of collected materials, most of which probably circulated orally perhaps even in single aphorisms or small collections. Insufficient study of the text has been done to formulate any consensus about whether the text was composed using smaller written collections.

For almost 2,000 years, the Chinese text used by commentators in China and upon which all except the most recent Western language translations were based has been called the Wang Bi, after the commentator who used a complete edition of the DDJ sometime between 226-249 CE. Although Wang Bi was not a Daoist, his commentary became a standard interpretive guide, and generally speaking even today scholars depart from it only when they can make a compelling argument for doing so. Based on recent archaeological finds at Guodian in 1993 and Mawangdui in the 1970s we are certain that there were several simultaneously circulating versions of the Daodejing text.

Mawangdui is the name for a site of tombs discovered near Changsha in Hunan province. The Mawangdui discoveries consist of two incomplete editions of the DDJ on silk scrolls (boshu) now simply called "A" and "B." These versions have two principal differences from the Wang Bi. Some word choice divergencies are present. The order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the Mawangdui versions. More precisely, the order of the Mawangdui texts takes the traditional 81 chapters and sets them out like this: 38, 39, 40, 42-66, 80, 81, 67-79, 1-21, 24, 22, 23, 25-37. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu, Te-tao Ching. Contemporary scholarship associates the Mawangdui versions with a type of Daoism known as the Way of the Yellow Emperor and the Old Master (Huanglao Dao), since the Yellow Emperor was venerated alongside of Laozi as a patron of the teachings of Daoism. The prevailing view is that the present version of the DDJ probably reached its final form at the Qixia Academy of the Ji kingdom associated with Huanglao Daoism around the beginning of the 3rd century BCE.

The Guodian find consists of 730 inscribed bamboo slips found near the village of Guodian in Hubei province in 1993. There are 71 slips with material that is also found in 31 of the 81 chapters of the DDJ and corresponding to Chapters 1-66. It may date as early as c. 300 BCE. If this is a correct date, then the Daodejing was already extant in a written form when the "inner chapters" (see below) of the Zhuangzi were composed. These slips contain more significant variants from the Wang Bi than the Mawangdui versions.

5. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing

The term Dao means a road, and is often translated as "the Way." This is because sometimes dao is used as a nominative (that is, "the dao") and other times as a verb (i.e. daoing). Dao is the process of reality itself, the way things come together, while still transforming. All this reflects the deep seated Chinese belief that change is the most basic character of things. In the Yi jing (Classic of Change) the patterns of this change are symbolized by figures standing for 64 relations of correlative forces and known as the hexagrams. Dao is the alteration of these forces, most often simply stated as yin and yang. The Xici is a commentary on the Yi jing formed in about the same period as the DDJ. It takes the taiji (Great Ultimate) as the source of correlative change and associates it with the dao. The contrast is not between what things are or that something is or is not, but between chaos (hundun) and the way reality is ordering (de). Yet, reality is not ordering into one unified whole. It is the 10,000 things (wanwu). There is the dao but not "the World" or "the cosmos" in a Western sense.

The Daodejing teaches that humans cannot fathom the Dao, because any name we give to it cannot capture it. It is beyond what we can conceive (ch.1). Those who wu wei may become one with it and thus "obtain the dao." Wu wei is a difficult notion to translate. Yet, it is generally agreed that the traditional rendering of it as "nonaction" or "no action" is incorrect. Those who wu wei do act. Daoism is not a philosophy of "doing nothing." Wu wei means something like "act naturally," "effortless action," or "nonwillful action." The point is that there is no need for human tampering with the flow of reality. Wu wei should be our way of life, because the dao always benefits, it does not harm (ch. 81) The way of heaven (dao of tian) is always on the side of good (ch. 79) and virtue (de) comes forth from the dao alone (ch. 21). What causes this natural embedding of good and benefit in the dao is vague and elusive (ch. 35), not even the sages understand it (ch. 76). But the world is a reality that is filled with spiritual force, just as a sacred image used in religious ritual might be (ch. 29). The dao occupies the place in reality that is analogous to the part of a family's house set aside for the altar for venerating the ancestors and gods (the ao of the house, ch. 62). When we think that life's occurrences seem unfair (a human discrimination), we should remember that heaven's (tian) net misses nothing, it leaves nothing undone (ch. 37)

A central theme of the Daodejing is that correlatives are the expressions of the movement of dao. Correlatives in Chinese philosophy are not opposites, mutually excluding each other. They represent the ebb and flow of the forces of reality: yin/yang, male/female; excess/defect; leading/following; active/passive. As one approaches the fullness of yin, yang begins to horizon and emerge. Its teachings on correlation often suggest to interpreters that the DDJ is filled with paradoxes. For example, ch. 22 says, "Those who are crooked will be perfected. Those who are bent will be straight. Those who are empty will be full." While these appear paradoxical, they are probably better understood as correlational in meaning. The DDJ says, "straightforward words seem paradoxical," implying, however, that they are not (ch. 78).

What is the image of the ideal person, the sage (sheng ren), the real person (zhen ren) in the DDJ? Well, sages wu wei, (chs. 2, 63). In this respect, they are like newborn infants, who move naturally, without planning and reliance on the structures given to them by others (ch. 15). The DDJ tells us that sages empty themselves, becoming void of pretense. Sages concentrate their internal energies (qi). They clean their vision (ch. 10). They manifest plainness and become like uncarved wood (pu) (ch. 19). They live naturally and free from desires given by men (ch. 37) They settle themselves and know how to be content (ch. 46). The DDJ makes use of some very famous analogies to drive home its point. Sages know the value of emptiness as illustrated by how emptiness is used in a bowl, door, window, valley or canyon (ch. 11). They preserve the female (yin), meaning that they know how to be receptive and are not unbalanced favoring assertion and action (yang) (ch. 28). They shoulder yin and embrace yang, blend internal energies (qi) and thereby attain harmony (he) (ch. 42). Those following the dao do not strive, tamper, or seek control (ch. 64). They do not endeavor to help life along (ch. 55), or use their heart-mind (xin) to "solve" or "figure out" life's apparent knots and entanglements (ch. 55). Indeed, the DDJ cautions that those who would try to do something with the world will fail, they will actually ruin it (ch. 29). Sages do not engage in disputes and arguing, or try to prove their point (chs. 22, 81). They are pliable and supple, not rigid and resistive (chs. 76, 78). They are like water (ch. 8), finding their own place, overcoming the hard and strong by suppleness (ch. 36). Sages act with no expectation of reward (chs. 2, 51). They put themselves last and yet come first (ch. 7). They never make a display of themselves, (chs. 72, 22). They do not brag or boast, (chs. 22, 24) and they do not linger after their work is done (ch. 77). They leave no trace (ch. 27). Because they embody dao in practice, they have longevity (ch. 16). They create peace (ch. 32). Creatures do not harm them (chs. 50, 55). Soldiers do not kill them (ch. 50). Heaven (tian) protects the sage and the sage becomes invincible (ch. 67).

Among the most controversial of the teachings in the DDJ are those directly associated with rulers. Recent scholarship is moving toward a consensus that the persons who developed and collected the teachings of the DDJ played some role in civil administration, but they may also have been practitioners of ritual arts and what we would call religious rites. Be that as it may, many of the aphorisms directed toward rulers seem puzzling at first sight. According to the DDJ, the proper ruler keeps the people without knowledge, (ch. 65), fills their bellies, opens their hearts and empties them of desires (ch. 3). A sagely ruler reduces the size of the state and keeps the population small. Even though the ruler possesses weapons, they are not used (ch. 80). The ruler does not seek prominence. The ruler is a shadowy presence (chs. 17, 66). When the ruler's work is done, the people say they are content (ch. 17). This is all the more interesting when we remember that the philosopher and legalist political theorist named Han Feizi used the DDJ as a guide for the unification of China. Han Feizi was the foremost counselor of the first emperor of China, Qin Shihuangdi (r. 221-206 BCE). It is a pity that the emperor used the DDJ's admonitions to "fill the bellies and empty the minds" to justify his program of destroying all books not related to medicine, astronomy or agriculture.

6. The Zhuangzi

The second of the two most important classical texts of Daoism is the Zhuangzi. This text is a collection of stories and imaginary conversations known for its creativity and skillful use of language. The text contains longer and shorter treatises, stories, poetry, and aphorisms. It dates to the late 4th century BCE and originally had 52 "chapters." These were reduced to 33 by Guo Xiang in the 3rd century CE. Unlike the Daodejing which is ascribed to the mythological Laozi, the Zhuangzi may actually contain materials from a teacher known as Zhuang Zhou who lived between 370-300 BCE, according to Sima Qian. Chapters 1-7 are those most often ascribed to Zhuangzi himself (which is a title meaning "Master Zhuang") and these are known as the "inner chapters." The remaining 26 chapters had other origins and they sometimes take different points of view from the inner chapters. They are divided into the "outer chapters" (chs. 8-22) and "mixed chapters," (chs. 23-33). The full text probably did not reach its completed form until about 130 BCE.

7. Basic Concepts in the Zhuangzi

Zhuangzi taught that a set of practices, including meditation, helped one achieve unity with the dao and become a "true person" (zhen ren). The way to this state is not the result of a withdrawal from life. However, it does require a disengagement from conventional values and the demarcations made by society. In Chapter 23 of the Zhuangzi, a character inquiring of Laozi about the solution to his life's worries was answered promptly: "Why did you come with all this crowd of people?" The man looked around and confirmed he was standing alone, but Laozi meant that his problems were the result of all the baggage of ideas and conventional opinions he lugged about with him. This baggage must be discarded before anyone can be zhen ren. As we see in this case, the Zhuangzi often employs apparently nonsensical remarks and questions, as well as humor to make its points.

Like the DDJ, Zhuangzi also valorizes wu wei. For his examples of such living Zhuangzi turns to analogies of craftsmen, athletes (swimmers), woodcarvers, and even butchers. One of the most famous stories in the text is that of Ding the Butcher, who learned what it means to wu wei through the perfection of his craft. When asked about his great skill, Ding says, "What I care about is dao, which goes beyond skill. When I first began cutting up oxen, all I could see was the ox itself. After three years I no longer saw the whole ox. And now—now I go at it by spirit and don't look with my eyes. Perception and understanding have come to a stop and spirit moves where it wants. I go along with the natural makeup, strike in the big hollows, guide the knife through the big openings, and follow things as they are. So I never touch the smallest ligament or tendon, much less a main joint. A good cook changes his knife once a year—because he cuts. A mediocre cook changes his knife once a month—because he hacks. I've had this knife of mine for nineteen years and I've cut up thousands of oxen with it, and yet the blade is as good as though it had just come from the grindstone. There are spaces between the joints, and the blade of the knife has really no thickness….[I] move the knife with the greatest subtlety, until—flop! The whole thing comes apart like a clod of earth crumbling to the ground." (Ch. 3, The Secret of Caring for Life)

Persons who exemplify such understanding are called sages, zhen ren, and immortals. Zhuangzi describes the Daoist sage in such a way as to suggest that he possesses extraordinary powers. This is the result of a way of living that cannot be dichotomized into philosophical and religious categories. Early Daoism makes no such demarcation. Being able to have union with the dao means to see from the viewpoint of the dao, and not by the limits of the conceptual and sensory apparatus that confines us (the way Ding moves his knife through the meat without looking).

Zhuangzi is drawing on a set of beliefs that were probably regarded as literal by many, although some think he meant these to be taken metaphorically. For example, when Zhuangzi says that the sage cannot be harmed or made to suffer by anything that life presents, does he mean this to be taken as saying that the zhen ren is physically invincible? Or, does he mean that the sage has so freed himself from all conventional understandings that he refuses to recognize poverty as any more or less desirable than affluence, to recognize blindness as worse than sight, to recognize death as any less desirable than life? As the Zhuangzi says in Chapter One, Free and Easy Wandering, "There is nothing that can harm this man." This is also the theme of Chapter Two, On Making All Things Equal. In this chapter people are urged to "make all things one," meaning that they should recognize that reality is one. It is human judgment that what happens is beautiful or ugly, right or wrong, fortunate or not. The sage knows all things are one (equal) and does not judge. Our lives are snarled and jumbled so long as we make conventional discriminations, but when we set them aside, we appear to others as extraordinary and enchanted.

An important theme in the Zhuangzi is the use of immortals to illustrate various points. Did Zhuangzi believe some persons physically lived forever? Well, many Daoists did believe this. Did Zhuangzi believe that our substance was eternal and only our form changed? Almost certainly Zhuangzi thought that we were in a constant state of process, changing from one form into another (see the exchange between Master Lai and Master Li in Ch. 6, The Great and Venerable Teacher). In Daoism, immortality is the result of what is called a wu xing transformation. Wu xing means "five phases" and it refers to the Chinese understanding of reality according to which all things are in some state of combined correlation of wood, fire, water, metal, and earth. This was not a "Daoist" physics. It underlay all Chinese "science" of the classical period, although Daoists certainly made use of it. Zhuangzi wants to teach us how to engage in transformation through meditation, breathing, and experience (see ch. 6). And yet, perhaps Zhuangzi's teachings on immortality mean that the person who is free of discrimination makes no difference between life and death. In the words of Lady Li in Ch. 2, "How do I know that the dead do not wonder why they ever longed for life?"

Huangdi (the Yellow Emperor) is the most prominent immortal mentioned in the text. He had long been venerated as a cultural exemplar and the inventor of civilized human life. Daoism is filled with accounts designed to show that those who learn to live according to the according to the dao have long lives. Pengzu, one of the characters in the Zhuangzi, is said to have lived eight hundred years. The most prominent female immortal is Xiwangmu (Queen Mother of the West), who was believed to reign over the sacred and mysterious Mount Kunlun.

The Daoists did not think of immortality as a gift from a god, or an achievement in the religious sense commonly thought of in the West. It was a result of finding harmony with the dao, expressed through wisdom, meditation, and wu wei. Persons who had such knowledge were reputed to live in the mountains, thus the character for xian (immortal) is made up of two components, the one being shan "mountain" and the other being ren "person." Undoubtedly, some removal to the mountains was a part of the journey to becoming a zhen ren "true person." Because Daoists believed that nature and our own bodies were correlations of each other, they imagined their bodies as mountains inhabited by immortals. The struggle to wu wei was an effort to become immortal, to be born anew, to grow the embryo of immortality inside. A part of the disciplines of Daoism included imitation of the animals of nature, because they were thought to act without the intention and willfulness that characterized humans. Physical exercises included animal dances (wu qin xi) and movements designed to enable the unrestricted flow of the cosmic life force from which all things are made (qi). Other movements designed to channel the flow of qi are called tai qi or qi gong. Daoists practiced breathing exercises, used herbal remedies, and they employed an instruction booklet for sexual positions and intercourse, all designed to enhance the flow of qi energy. They even practiced external alchemy, using burners to modify the composition of cinnabar and mercury into potions to drink and pills to ingest for the purpose of adding longevity. Many Daoist practitioners died as a result of these alchemical substances, and even a few Emperors who followed their instructions lost their lives as well.

The attitude and practices necessary to the pursuit of immortality made this life all the more significant. Butcher Ding is a master butcher because his qi is in harmony with the dao. Daoist practices were meant for everyone, regardless of their origin, gender, social position, or wealth. However, Daoism was a complete philosophy of life and not an easy way to learn.

When superior persons learn the Dao, they practice it with zest.

When average persons learn of the Dao, they are indifferent.

When petty persons learn of the Dao, they laugh loudly.

If they did not laugh, it would not be worthy of being the Dao.

Daodejing, 41

8. Daoism and Confucianism

Arguably, Daoism shared some emphases with classical Confucianism such as self-cultivation and a this-worldly concern for the concrete details of life rather than on abstractions and ideals. Nevertheless, it largely represented an alternative and critical tradition divergent from that of Confucius. While many of these criticisms are controversial, some seem clear.

One of the most fundamental teachings of DDJ is that human discriminations, such as in morality (good, bad) and aesthetics (beauty, ugly) generate the troubles and problems of existence (ch. 3a). The clear implication is that the person following the dao must cease ordering his life according to human-made distinctions (ch. 19). Indeed, it is only when the dao recedes that these demarcations emerge (chs. 18; 38), because they are a form of disease (ch. 74). Daoists believe that the dao is untangling the knots of life, blunting the sharp edges of relationships and problems, and turning down the light on painful occurrences (ch. 4). So, it is best to practice wu-wei in all endeavors, to act naturally and not willfully try to oppose or tamper with how reality is moving.

Confucius and his followers wanted to change the world and be proactive in setting things straight. They wanted to tamper, orchestrate, plan, educate, develop, and propose solutions. Daoists take their hands off of life, and Confucians want their fingerprints on everything. Imagine this comparison. If the Daoist goal is to become like a piece of unhewn and natural wood, the goal of the Confucians is to become a carved sculpture. The Daoists put the piece before us just as it is found, and the Confucians polish it, shape it, and decorate it.

Confucians think they can engineer reality, understand it, name it, control it. But the Daoists think that such endeavors are the source of our frustration and fragmentation (DDJ, chs. 57, 72). They believe the Confucians create a gulf between humans and nature, that weakens and destroys us. Indeed, as far as the Daoists are concerned, the Confucian project is like a cancer that saps our very life. This is a fundamental difference in how these two great philosophical traditions think persons should approach life, and as shown above it is a consistent difference found also between the Zhuangzi and Confucianism.

9. Daoism in the Han

The teachings that were later called Daoism were first known under the name of Huanglao Dao in the 3rd and 2nd cent. BCE. The thought world transmitted in this stream is what Sima Tan meant by Daojia. The Huanglao school was a center of Daoist practitioners in the state of Qi (modern Shandong). Huangdi was the name for the Yellow Emperor, from whom the rulers of Qi said they were descended. When Emperor Wu, the sixth sovereign of the Han dynasty (r. 140-87 BCE) elevated Confucianism to the status of the official state ideology and training in it became mandatory for all bureaucratic officials, the tension with Daoism became more evident. And yet, at court people still sought longevity. Wu continued to engage in many Daoist practices, including the use of alchemy, climbing sacred Taishan (Mt. Tai), and presenting petitions to heaven. Wu forced his Daoist relative Liu An, the Prince of Huainan to commit suicide. Liu's death meant the end of the Daoist academy he had established and which was associated with the production of the work called the Master of Huainan (Huainanzi, 180-122 BCE). The text was an attempt to merge cosmology, Confucian ideals, and a political theory using "quotes" attributed to Huangdi, although the statements are actually from the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. All this is of added significance because in the later Han work, Laozi binahua jing (Book of the Transformations of Laozi) the Chinese physics that persons and objects change forms was employed in order to identify Laozi with Huangdi, and also with taiyi (the ultimate reality or god whose residence was in the Big Dipper). This explains also why the Han bureaucracy became identified with the Big Dipper.

10. Celestial Masters Daoism

Even though Emperor Wu forced Daoist practitioners from court, Daoist teachings were still able to create a discontent with the policies of the Han. Popular uprisings sprouted. The Yellow Turban movement, that tried to overthrow Han imperial authority in the name of Huangdi and promised to establish the Way of Great Peace (Tai ping). The basic moral and philosophical text of this movement was the Classic of Great Peace (Taiping jing). The present version of this work in the Daoist canon is a later and altered iteration of the original text dating about 166 CE.

Easily the most important of the Daoist trends at the end of the Han period was the wudou mi dao (Way of Five Bushels of Rice) movement, best known as the Way of the Celestial Masters (tianshi dao). This movement is traceable to a Daoist hermit named Zhang ling, or Zhang Daoling, who resided on a mountain near modern Chengdu in Sichuan. The story goes that Laozi appeared to Zhang (c. 142 CE) and gave him a commission to announce the soon end of the world and the coming age of Great Peace (taiping). The revelation said that those who followed Zhang would become part of the Orthodox One Covenant with the Powers of the Universe (Zhengyi meng wei). Zhang began the movement that culminated in a Celestial Master state. The administrators of this state were called libationers (ji jiu), because they performed religious rites, as well as political duties. They taught that personal illness and civil mishap were owing to the mismanagement of the forces of the body and nature. The libationers taught a strict form of morality and maintained registers of the moral conduct of the people. They were moral investigators, standing in for a greater celestial bureaucracy. The Celestial Master state developed against the background of the decline of the later Han dynasty. Indeed, when the empire finally decayed, the Celestial Master government was the only order in much of southern China.

When the Wei dynastic rulers became uncomfortable with the Celestial Masters' power, they broke up the state. But this backfired because it actually served to disperse Celestial Masters followers throughout China. Many of the refugees settled near X'ian. The movement remained strong because its leaders had assembled a canon of texts [Statutory Texts of the One and Orthodox (Zhengyi fawen)]. This group of writings included philosophical, political, and ritual texts. It became a fundamental part of the later authorized Daoist canon.

11. Neo-Daoism

The resurgence of Daoism after the Han dynasty is often known as Neo-Daoism. Wang Bi and Guo Xiang who wrote commentaries respectively on the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, were the most important voices in this development. Traditionally, the famous "Seven Sages of the Bamboo Grove" (Zhulin qixian) have also been associated with the new Daoist way of life that expressed itself in culture and not merely in mountain retreats. These thinkers included landscape painters, calligraphers, poets, and musicians. Among the philosophers of this period, the great representative of Daoism in southern China was Ge Hong (283-343 CE). He practiced not only philosophical reflection, but also external alchemy, manipulating mineral substances such as mercury and cinnabar. His work the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity (Baopuzi neipian) is the most important Daoist philosophical work of this period. For him, longevity and immortality are not the same, the former is only the first step to the latter.

12. Shangqing and Lingbao Daoist Movements

After the invasion of China by nomads from Central Asia, Daoists of the Celestial Master tradition who had been living in the north were forced to migrate into southern China, where Ge Hong's version of Daoism was strong. The mixture of these two traditions is represented in the writings of the Xu family. The Xu family was an aristocratic group from what is today the city of Nanjing. Seeking Daoist philosophical wisdom and the long life it promised, many of them moved to Mao Shan mountain, near the city. There they claimed to receive revelations from immortals, who dictated new wisdom and morality texts to them. Yang Xi was the most prominent recipient of the Maoshan revelations (360-370 CE). These revelations came from spirits who were local heroes named the Mao brothers, but they had been transformed into deities. Yang Xi's writings formed the basis for High Purity (Shangqing) Daoism. The writings were extraordinarily well done and even the calligraphy in which they were written was beautiful.

The importance of these texts philosophically speaking is to be found in their idealization of the quest for immortality and transference of the material practices of the alchemical science of Ge Hong into a form of reflective meditation. In fact, the Shangqing school of Daoism is the beginning of the tradition known as "inner alchemy" (neidan), an individual mystical pursuit of wisdom.

Some thirty years after the Maoshan revelations, a descendent of Ge Hong, named Ge Chaofu went into a mediumistic trance and authored a set of texts called the Lingbao teachings. These works were ritual recitation texts similar to Buddhist sutras, and indeed they borrowed heavily from Buddhism. At first, the Shangqing and Lingbao texts belonged to the general stream of the Celestial Masters and were not considered separate sects or movements within Daoism, although later lineages of masters emphasized the uniqueness of their teachings.

13. Tang Daoism

As the Lingbao texts illustrate, Daoism acted as a receiving structure for Buddhism. Many early translators of Buddhist texts used Daoist terms to render Indian ideas. Some Buddhists saw Laozi as an avatar of Shakyamuni (the Buddha), and some Daoists understood Shakyamuni as a manifestation of the dao, which also means he was a manifestation of Laozi. An often made generalization is that Buddhism held north China in the 4th and 5th centuries, and Daoism the south. But gradually this intellectual currency actually reversed. Daoism grew in scope and impact throughout China.

By the time of the Tang dynasty (618-906 CE) Daoism was the intellectual philosophy that underwrote the national understanding. The imperial family claimed to descend from Li (the family of Laozi). Laozi was venerated by royal decree. Officials received Daoist initiation as Masters of its philosophy, rituals, and practices. A major center for Daoist studies was created at Dragon and Tiger Mountain (long hu shan), chosen both for its feng shui and because of its strategic location at the intersection of numerous southern China trade routes. The Celestial Masters who held leadership at Dragon and Tiger mountain were later called "Daoist popes" by Christian missionaries because they had considerable political power.

In aesthetics, two great Daoist intellectuals worked during the Tang. Wu Daozi developed the rules for Daoist painting and Li Bai became its most famous poet. Interestingly, Daoist alchemists invented gunpowder during the Tang. The earliest block-print book on a scientific subject is a Daoist work entitled Xuanjie lu (850 CE). As Buddhism gradually grew stronger during the Tang, Daoist and Confucian intellectuals sought to initiate a conversation with it. The Buddhism that resulted was a reformed version known as Chan (Zen in Japan).

14. The Three Teachings

During the Five Dynasties (907-960 CE) and Song periods (960-1279 CE) Confucianism enjoyed a resurgence and Daoists found their place by teaching that principal thinkers of their tradition were Confucian scholars as well. Most notable among these was Lu Dongbin, a Daoist immortal that many believed was originally a Confucian teacher.

Daoism became a complete philosophy of life, reaching into religion, social action, and individual health and physical well being. A huge network of Daoist temples known by the name Dongyue Miao (also called tianqing guan) was created through the empire, with a miao in virtually every town of any size. The Daoist masters who served these temples were appointed as government officials. They also gave medical, moral, and philosophical advice, and led religious rituals, dedicated especially to the Lord of the Sacred Mountain of the East named Taishan. Daoist masters had wide authority. All this was obvious in the temple iconography. Taishan was represented as the emperor, the City God (cheng huang) was a high official, and the Earth God was portrayed as a prosperous peasant. Daoism of this period integrated the Three Teachings (sanjiao) of China: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism. This process of synthesis continued throughout the Song and into the period of the Ming Dynasty.

Such a wide dispersal of Daoist thought and practice, taken together with its interest in merging Confucianism and Buddhism, eventually created a fragmented ideology. Into this confusion came Wang Zhe (1113-1170 CE), the founder of Quanzhen (Total Truth) Daoism. It was Wang's goal to bring the three teachings into a single great synthesis. For the first time, Daoist teachers adopted monastic forms of life, created monasteries, and organized themselves in ways they saw in Buddhism. This version of Daoist thought interpreted the classical texts of the DDJ and the Zhuangzi to call for a rejection of the body and material world. The Quanzhen order became powerful as the main partner of the Mongols (Yuan dynasty), who gave their patronage to its expansion. Frequently the Mongol emperors favored the Celestial Masters and their leader at Dragon and Tiger mountain in an effort to undermine the power of the Quanzhen leaders. For example, the Zhengyi (Celestial Master) master of Beijing in the 1220s was Zhang Liusun. Under patronage he was allowed to build a Dongyue Miao in the city in 1223 and make it the unofficial town hall of the capital. But by the time of Khubilai Khan (r. 1260-1294) the Buddhists were used against all Daoists. The Khan ordered all Daoist books except the DDJ to be destroyed in 1281, and he closed the Quanzhen monastery in the city known as Baiyun Guan (White Cloud Monastery).

When the Ming (1368-1644) dynasty emerged, the Mongols were expulsed, and Chinese rule was restored. The emperors sponsored the creation of the first complete Daoist Canon (Daozang), which was edited between 1408 and 1445. This was an eclectic collection, including many Buddhist and Confucian related texts. Daoist influence reached its zenith.

15. The "Destruction" of Daoism

The Manchurian tribes that became rulers of China in 1644 and founded the Qing dynasty were already under the influence of conservative Confucian exiles. They stripped the Celestial Master of Dragon Tiger Mountain of his power at court. Only Quanzhen was tolerated. Baiyun Guan (White Cloud Monastery) was reopened, and a new lineage of thinkers was organized. They called themselves the Dragon Gate lineage (Long men pai). In the 1780s, the Western traders arrived, and so did Christian missionaries. In 1849, the Hakka people of Guangxi province, among China's poorest citizens, rose in revolt. They followed Hong Xiuquan, who claimed to be Jesus' younger brother. This millennial movement built on a strange version of Chinese Christianity sought to establish the Heavenly Kingdom of Peace (taping). As the Taiping swept throughout southern China, they destroyed Buddhist and Daoist temples and texts wherever they found them. The Taiping army completely raised the Daoist complexes on Dragon Tiger Mountain. During most of the 20th century the drive to eradicate Daoist influence has continued. In the 1920s, the "New Life" movement drafted students to go out on Sundays to destroy Daoist statues and texts. In the year 1926 only two copies of the Daoist Canon (Daozang) existed and Daoist philosophical heritage was in great jeopardy. But permission was granted to copy the canon kept at the White Cloud Monastery, and so the texts were preserved for the world. There are 1120 titles in this collection in 5,305 volumes. Much of this material has yet to receive scholarly attention and very little of it has been translated into any Western language.

The Cultural Revolution (1966-1976) attempted to complete the destruction of Daoism. Masters were killed or "re-educated." Entire lineages were broken up and their texts were destroyed. The miaos were closed, burned, and turned into military barracks. At one time, there were 300 Daoist sites in Beijing alone, now there are only a handful. However, Daoism is not dead. It survives as a vibrant philosophical system and way of life as its evidenced by the revival of its practice and study in several new University institutes in the People's Republic.

16. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger and Hall, David. (2003). Daodejing: "Making This Life Significant" A Philosophical Translation. New York: Ballantine Books.
  • Ames, Roger. (1998). Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Bokenkamp, Stephen R. (1997). Early Daoist Scriptures. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Boltz, Judith M. (1987). A Survey of Taoist Literature: Tenth to Seventeenth Centuries, China Research Monograph 32. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Chan, Alan. (1991). Two Visions of the Way: A Translation and Study of the Heshanggong and Wang Bi Commentaries on the Laozi. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Creel, Herrlee G. (1970). What is Taoism? Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mark and Ivanhoe, Philip J., eds. (1999). Religious and Philosophical Aspects of the Laozi. Albany: State University of New York.
  • Girardot, Norman J. (1983). Myth and Meaning in Early Taoism: The Theme of Chaos (hun-tun). Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Graham, Angus. (1981). Chuang tzu: The Inner Chapters. London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Graham, Angus. (1989). Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court.
  • Graham, Angus. (1979). "How much of the Chuang-tzu Did Chuang-tzu Write?" Journal of the American Academy of Religion, Vol. 47, No. 3.
  • Hansen, Chad (1992). A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Henricks, Robert. (1989). Lao-Tzu: Te-Tao Ching. New York: Ballantine.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. (2002). The Daodejing of Laozi. New York: Seven Bridges Press.
  • Kjellberg, Paul and Ivanhoe, Philip J., eds. (1996) Essays on Skepticism, Relativism, and Ethics in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York.
  • Kohn, Livia and LaFargue, Michael., eds. (1998). Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Kohn, Livia and Roth, Harold., eds. (2002). Daoist Identity: History, Lineage, and Ritual. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.
  • LaFargue, Michael. (1992). The Tao of the Tao-te-ching. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Lin, Paul J. (1977). A Translation of Lao-tzu's Tao-te-ching and Wang Pi's Commentary. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan.
  • Lau, D.C. (1982). Chinese Classics: Tao Te Ching. Hong Kong: Hong Kong University Press.
  • Lynn, Richard John. (1999). The Classic of the Way and Virtue: A New Translation of the Tao-Te Ching of Laozi as Interpreted by Wang Bi. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Mair, Victor. (1990). Tao Te Ching: The Classic Book of Integrity and the Way. New York: Bantam Press.
  • Maspero, Henri. (1981). Taoism and Chinese Religion. Amherst: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Robinet, Isabelle. (1997). Taoism: Growth of a Religion. Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Roth, Harold. (2003). A Companion to Angus C. Graham's Chuang Tzu: The Inner Chapters. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.
  • Roth, Harold D. (1992). The Textual History of the Huai Nanzi. Ann Arbor: Association of Asian Studies.
  • Roth, Harold D. (1991). "Who Compiled the Chuang Tzu?" In Chinese Texts and Philosophical Contexts, ed. Henry Rosemont, 84-95. La Salle: Open Court.
  • Schipper, Kristofer. (1993). The Taoist Body Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Slingerland, Edward, (2003). Effortless Action: Wu-Wei As Conceptual Metaphor and Spiritual Ideal in Early China. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Waley, Arthur (1934). The Way and Its Power: A Study of the Tao Te Ching and its Place in Chinese Thought. London: Allen & Unwin
  • Watson, Burton. (1968). The Complete Works of Chuang Tzu. New York: Columbia University Press
  • Welch, Holmes. (1966). Taoism: The Parting of the Way. Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Welch, Holmes and Seidel, Anna, eds. (1979). Facets of Taoism. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.

Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803—1882)

emersonIn his lifetime, Ralph Waldo Emerson became the most widely known man of letters in America, establishing himself as a prolific poet, essayist, popular lecturer, and an advocate of social reforms who was nevertheless suspicious of reform and reformers. Emerson achieved some reputation with his verse, corresponded with many of the leading intellectual and artistic figures of his day, and during an off and on again career as a Unitarian minister, delivered and later published a number of controversial sermons. Emerson’s enduring reputation, however, is as a philosopher, an aphoristic writer (like Friedrich Nietzsche) and a quintessentially American thinker whose championing of the American Transcendental movement and influence on Walt Whitman, Henry David Thoreau, William James, and others would alone secure him a prominent place in American cultural history. Transcendentalism in America, of which Emerson was the leading figure, resembled British Romanticism in its precept that a fundamental continuity exists between man, nature, and God, or the divine. What is beyond nature is revealed through nature; nature is itself a symbol, or an indication of a deeper reality, in Emerson’s philosophy. Matter and spirit are not opposed but reflect a critical unity of experience. Emerson is often characterized as an idealist philosopher and indeed used the term himself of his philosophy, explaining it simply as a recognition that plan always precedes action. For Emerson, all things exist in a ceaseless flow of change, and “being” is the subject of constant metamorphosis. Later developments in his thinking shifted the emphasis from unity to the balance of opposites: power and form, identity and variety, intellect and fate. Emerson remained throughout his lifetime the champion of the individual and a believer in the primacy of the individual’s experience. In the individual can be discovered all truths, all experience. For the individual, the religious experience must be direct and unmediated by texts, traditions, or personality. Central to defining Emerson’s contribution to American thought is his emphasis on non-conformity that had so profound an effect on Thoreau. Self-reliance and independence of thought are fundamental to Emerson’s perspective in that they are the practical expressions of the central relation between the self and the infinite. To trust oneself and follow our inner promptings corresponds to the highest degree of consciousness.

Emerson concurred with the German poet and philosopher Johann Wolfgang von Goethe that originality was essentially a matter of reassembling elements drawn from other sources. Not surprisingly, some of Emerson’s key ideas are popularizations of both European as well as Eastern thought. From Goethe, Emerson also drew the notion of “bildung,” or development, calling it the central purpose of human existence. From the English Romantic poet and critic Samuel Taylor Coleridge, Emerson borrowed his conception of “Reason,” which consists of acts of perception, insight, recognition, and cognition. The concepts of “unity” and “flux” that are critical to his early thought and never fully depart from his philosophy are basic to Buddhism: indeed, Emerson said, perhaps ironically, that “the Buddhist . . . is a Transcendentalist.” From his friend the social philosopher Margaret Fuller, Emerson acquired the perspective that ideas are in fact ideas of particular persons, an observation he would expand into his more general—and more famous—contention that history is biography.

On the other hand, Emerson’s work possesses deep original strains that influenced other major philosophers of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. The German philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche read Emerson in German translations and his developing philosophy of the great man is clearly influenced and confirmed by the contact. Writing about the Greek philosopher Plato, Emerson asserted that “Every book is a quotation . . . and every man is a quotation,” a perspective that foreshadows the work of French Structuralist philosopher Roland Barthes. Emerson also anticipates the key Poststructuralist concept of différance found in the work of Jacques Derrida and Jacques Lacan—“It is the same among men and women, as among the silent trees; always a referred existence, an absence, never a presence and satisfaction.” While not progressive on the subject of race by modern standards, Emerson observed that the differences among a particular race are greater than the differences between the races, a view compatible with the social constructivist theory of race found in the work of contemporary philosophers like Kwame Appiah.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Major Works
  3. Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Ralph Waldo Emerson was born on May 25, 1803, in Boston to Ruth Haskins Emerson and William Emerson, pastor of Boston's First Church. The cultural milieu of Boston at the turn of the nineteenth century would increasingly be marked by the conflict between its older conservative values and the radical reform movements and social idealists that emerged in the decades leading up through the 1840s. Emerson was one of five surviving sons who formed a supportive brotherhood, the financial and emotional leadership of which he was increasingly forced to assume over the years. "Waldo," as Emerson was called, entered Harvard at age fourteen, taught in the summer, waited tables, and with his brother Edward, wrote papers for other students to pay his expenses. Graduating in the middle of his class, Emerson taught in his brother William's school until 1825 when he entered the Divinity School at Harvard. The pattern of Emerson's intellectual life was shaped in these early years by the range and depth of his extracurricular reading in history, literature, philosophy, and religion, the extent of which took a severe toll on his eyesight and health. Equally important to his intellectual development was the influence of his paternal aunt Mary Moody Emerson. Though she wrote primarily on religious subjects, Mary Moody Emerson set an example for Emerson and his brothers with her wide reading in every branch of knowledge and her stubborn insistence that they form opinions on all of the issues of the day. Mary Moody Emerson was at the same time passionately orthodox in religion and a lover of controversy, an original thinker tending to a mysticism that was a precursor to her nephew's more radical beliefs. His aunt's influence waned as he developed away from her strict orthodoxy, but her relentless intellectual energy and combative individualism left a permanent stamp on Emerson as a thinker.

In 1829, he accepted a call to serve as junior pastor at Boston's Second Church, serving only until 1832 when he resigned at least in part over his objections to the validity of the Lord's Supper. Emerson would in 1835 refuse a call as minister to East Lexington Church but did preach there regularly until 1839. In 1830, Emerson married Ellen Tucker who died the following year of tuberculosis. Emerson married again in 1835 to Lydia Jackson. Together they had four children, the eldest of whom, Waldo, died at the age of five, an event that left deep scars on the couple and altered Emerson's outlook on the redemptive value of suffering. Emerson’s first book Nature was published anonymously in 1836 and at Emerson's own expense. In 1837 Emerson delivered his famous "American Scholar" lecture as the Phi Beta Kappa address at Harvard, but his controversial Harvard Divinity School address, delivered in 1838, was the occasion of a twenty-nine year breach with the university and signaled his divergence from even the liberal theological currents of Cambridge. Compelled by financial necessity to undertake a career on the lecture circuit, Emerson began lecturing in earnest in 1839 and kept a demanding public schedule until 1872. While providing Emerson's growing family and array of dependents with a steady income, the lecture tours heightened public awareness of Emerson's ideas and work. From 1840-1844, Emerson edited The Dial with Margaret Fuller. Essays: First Series was published in 1841, followed by Essays: Second Series in 1844, the two volumes most responsible for Emerson's reputation as a philosopher. In 1844, Emerson also purchased the land on the shore of Walden Pond where he was to allow the naturalist and philosopher Henry David Thoreau to build a cabin the following year. While sympathetic to the experimental collective at Brook Farm, Emerson declined urgent appeals to join the group and maintained his own household in Concord with Lydia and their growing family. Emerson attempted to create his own community of kindred spirits, however, assembling in the neighborhood of Concord a group of writers including Thoreau, Nathaniel Hawthorne, the social thinker Margaret Fuller, the reformer Bronson Alcott, and the poet Ellery Channing. English Traits was inspired by a trip to Britain during 1847-1848. By the 1850s, Emerson was an outspoken advocate of abolition in lectures across New England and the Midwest and continued lecturing widely on a number of different topics—eighty lectures in 1867 alone. Emerson spent the final years of his life peacefully but without full use of his faculties. He died of pneumonia in 1882 at his home in Concord.

2. Major Works

As a philosopher, Emerson primarily makes use of two forms, the essay and the public address or lecture. His career began, however, with a short book, Nature, published anonymously in 1836. Nature touches on many of the ideas to which he would return to again and again over his lifetime, most significantly the perspective that nature serves as an intermediary between human experience and what lies beyond nature. Emerson expresses a similar idea in his claim that spirit puts forth nature through us, exemplary of which is the famous "transparent eye-ball" passage, in which he writes that on a particular evening, while “crossing a bare common . . . the currents of Universal Being circulate through me." On the strength this passage alone, Nature has been widely viewed as a defining text of Transcendentalism, praised and satirized for the same qualities. Emerson invokes the "transparent eye-ball" to describe the loss of individuation in the experience of nature, where there is no seer, only seeing: "I am nothing; I see all." This immersion in nature compensates us in our most difficult adversity and provides a sanctification of experience profoundly religious —the direct religious experience that Emerson was to call for all his life. While Emerson characterizes traversing the common with mystical language, it is also importantly a matter of knowledge. The fundamental knowledge of nature that circulates through him is the basis of all human knowledge but cannot be distinguished, in Emerson's thought, from divine understanding.

The unity of nature is the unity of variety, and "each particle is a microcosm." There is, Emerson writes “a universal soul” that, influenced by Coleridge, he named "reason." Nature is by turns exhortative and pessimistic, like the work of the English Romantics, portraying man as a creature fallen away from a primordial connection with nature. Man ought to live in a original relation to the universe, an assault on convention he repeats in various formulas throughout his life; however, "man is the dwarf of himself . . . is disunited with himself . . . is a god in ruins." Nature concludes with a version of Emerson's permanent program, the admonition to conform your life to the "pure idea in your mind," a prescription for living he never abandons.

"The American Scholar" and “The Divinity School Address” are generally held to be representative statements of Emerson's early period. "The American Scholar," delivered as the Phi Beta Kappa oration at Harvard in 1837, repeats a call for a distinctively American scholarly life and a break with European influences and models—a not original appeal in the 1830s. Emerson begins with a familiar critique of American and particularly New England culture by asserting that Americans were "a people too busy to give to letters any more." What must have surprised the audience was his anti-scholarly theme, that "Books are for the scholar's idle times," an idea that aligns the prodigiously learned and widely read Emerson with the critique of excessive bookishness found in Wordsworth and English Romanticism. Continuing in this theme, Emerson argues against book knowledge entirely and in favor of lived experience: "Only so much do I know, as I have lived." Nature is the most important influence on the mind, he told his listeners, and it is the same mind, one mind, that writes and reads. Emerson calls for both creative writing and "creative reading," individual development being essential for the encounter with mind found in books. The object of scholarly culture is not the bookworm but "Man Thinking," Emerson's figure for an active, self-reliant intellectual life that thus puts mind in touch with Mind and the "Divine Soul." Through this approach to the study of letters, Emerson predicts that in America "A nation of men will for the first time exist."

"The Divinity School Address," also delivered at Harvard in 1838, was considerably more controversial and marked in earnest the beginning of Emerson's opposition to the climate of organized religion in his day, even the relatively liberal theology of Cambridge and the Unitarian Church. Emerson set out defiantly to insist on the divinity of all men rather than one single historical personage, a position at odds with Christian orthodoxy but one central to his entire system of thought. The original relation to nature Emerson insisted upon ensures an original relation to the divine, not copied from the religious experience of others, even Jesus of Nazareth. Emerson observes that in the universe there is a "justice" operative in the form of compensation: “He who does a good deed is instantly ennobled." This theme he would develop powerfully into a full essay, "Compensation” (1841). Whether Emerson characterized it as compensation, retribution, balance, or unity, the principle of an automatic response to all human action, good or ill, was a permanent fixture of his thought. "Good is positive," he argued to the vexation of many in the audience, “evil merely privative, not absolute." Emerson concludes his address with a subversive call to rely on one's self, to "go alone; to refuse the good models.”

Two of Emerson's first non-occasional public lectures from this early period contain especially important expressions of his thought. Always suspicious of reform and reformers, Emerson was yet an advocate of reform causes. In "Man the Reformer" (1841), Emerson expresses this ambivalence by speculating that if we were to "Let our affection flow out to our fellows; it would operate in a day the greatest of all revolutions." In an early and partial formulation of his theory that all people, times, and places are essentially alike, he writes in "Lecture on the Times" (1841) that “The Times . . . have their root in an invisible spiritual reality;" then more fully in "The Transcendentalist” (1842): “new views . . . are not new, but the very oldest of thoughts cast into the mould of these new times." Such ideas, while quintessential Emerson, are nevertheless positions that he would qualify and complicate over the next twenty years.

Emerson brought out his Essays: First Series, in 1841, which contain perhaps his single most influential work, "Self-Reliance." Emerson's style as an essayist, not unlike the form of his public lectures, operates best at the level of the individual sentence. His essays are bound together neither by their stated theme nor the progression of argument, but instead by the systematic coherence of his thought alone. Indeed, the various titles of Emerson's do not limit the subject matter of the essays but repeatedly bear out the abiding concerns of his philosophy. Another feature of his rhetorical style involves exploring the contrary poles of a particular idea, similar to a poetic antithesis. As a philosopher-poet, Emerson employs a highly figurative style, while his poetry is remarkable as a poetry of ideas. The language of the essays is sufficiently poetical that Thoreau felt compelled to say critically of the essays—"they were not written exactly at the right crisis [to be poetry] though inconceivably near it." In “History” Emerson attempts to demonstrate the unity of experience of men of all ages: "What Plato has thought, he may think; what a saint has felt, he may feel; what at any time has befallen any man, he may understand." Interestingly, for an idealist philosopher, he describes man as "a bundle of relations." The experience of the individual self is of such importance in Emerson's conception of history that it comes to stand for history: "there is properly no history; only biography." Working back from this thought, Emerson connects his understanding of this essential unity to his fundamental premise about the relation of man and nature: "the mind is one, and that nature is correlative." By correlative, Emerson means that mind and nature are themselves representative, symbolic, and consequently correlate to spiritual facts. In the wide-ranging style of his essays, he returns to the subject of nature, suggesting that nature is itself a repetition of a very few laws, and thus implying that history repeats itself consistently with a few recognizable situations. Like the Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard, Emerson disavowed nineteenth century notions of progress, arguing in the next essay of the book, "Society never advances . . . For everything that is given, something is taken."

"Self-Reliance" is justly famous as a statement of Emerson's credo, found in the title and perhaps uniquely among his essays, consistently and without serious digression throughout the work. The emphasis on the unity of experience is the same: "what is true for you in your private heart is true for all men." Emerson rests his abiding faith in the individual—"Trust thyself”—on the fundamental link between each man and the divine reality, or nature, that works through him. Emerson wove this explicit theme of self-trust throughout his work, writing in "Heroism" (1841), “Self-trust is the essence of heroism.” The apostle of self-reliance perceived that the impulses that move us may not be benign, that advocacy of self-trust carried certain social risks. No less a friend of Emerson's than Herman Melville parodied excessive faith in the individual through the portrait of Captain Ahab in his classic American novel, Moby-Dick. Nevertheless, Emerson argued that if our promptings are bad they come from our inmost being. If we are made thus we have little choice in any case but to be what we are. Translating this precept into the social realm, Emerson famously declares, "Whoso would be a man must be a nonconformist"—a point of view developed at length in both the life and work of Thoreau. Equally memorable and influential on Walt Whitman is Emerson's idea that "a foolish consistency is the hobgoblin of small minds, adored by little statesmen and philosophers and divines." In Leaves of Grass, Whitman made of his contradictions a virtue by claiming for himself a vastness of character that encompassed the vastness of the American experience. Emerson opposes on principle the reliance on social structures (civil, religious) precisely because through them the individual approaches the divine second hand, mediated by the once original experience of a genius from another age: "An institution," as he explains, “is the lengthened shadow of one man." To achieve this original relation one must "Insist on one's self; never imitate” for if the relationship is secondary the connection is lost. "Nothing," Emerson concludes, “can bring you peace but the triumph of principles,” a statement that both in tone and content illustrates the vocational drive of the former minister to speak directly to a wide audience and preach a practical philosophy of living.

Three years later in 1844 Emerson published his Essays: Second Series, eight essays and one public lecture, the titles indicating the range of his interests: "The Poet," “Experience,” “Character,” “Manners,” “Gifts,” “Nature,” “Politics,” “Nominalist and Realist," and "New England Reformers.” “The Poet” contains the most comprehensive statement on Emerson's aesthetics and art. This philosophy of art has its premise in the Transcendental notion that the power of nature operates through all being, that it is being: "For we are not pans and barrows . . . but children of the fire, made of it, and only the same divinity transmuted." Art and the products of art of every kind—poetry, sculpture, painting, and architecture—flow from the same unity at the root of all human experience. Emerson's aesthetics stress not the object of art but the force that creates the art object, or as he characterizes this process in relation to poetry: "it is not metres, but a metre-making argument that makes a poem." “The Poet” repeats anew the Emersonian dictum that nature is itself a symbol, and thus nature admits of being used symbolically in art. While Emerson does not accept in principle social progress as such, his philosophy emphasizes the progress of spirit, particularly when understood as development. This process he allies with the process of art: "Nature has a higher end . . . ascension, or the passage of the soul into higher forms." The realm of art, ultimately for Emerson, is only an intermediary function, not an end itself: "Art is the path of the creator to his work." On this and every subject, Emerson reveals the humanism at the core of his philosophy, his human centric perspective that posits the creative principle above the created thing. "There is a higher work for Art than the arts," he argues in the essay "Art," and that work is the full creative expression of human being. Nature too has this “humanism,” to speak figuratively, in its creative process, as he writes in "The Method of Nature:" “The universe does not attract us until housed in an individual.” Most notable in "The Poet" is Emerson's call for an expressly American poetry and poet to do justice to the fact that “America is a poem in our eyes." What is required is a "genius . . . with tyrannous eye, which knew the value of our incomparable materials” and can make use of the "barbarism and materialism of the times." Emerson would not meet Whitman for another decade, only after Whitman had sent him anonymously a copy of the first edition of Leaves of Grass, in which—indicative of Emerson's influence—Whitman self-consciously assumes the role of the required poet of America and asserts, like his unacknowledged mentor, that America herself is indeed a poem.

"Experience" remains one of Emerson's best-known and often-anthologized essays. It is also an essay written out of the devastating grief that struck the Emerson household after the death of their five-year-old son, Waldo. He wrote, whether out of conviction or helplessness, "I grieve that grief can teach me nothing." Emerson goes on, rocking back and forth between resignation and affirmation, establishing along the way a number of key points. In "Experience" he defines “spirit” as “matter reduced to an extreme thinness." In keeping with the gradual shift in his philosophy from an emphasis on the explanatory model of "unity” to images suggesting balance, he describes "human life" as consisting of “two elements, power and form, and the proportion must be invariably kept." Among his more quotable aphorisms is "The years teach us much which the days never know,” a memorable argument for the idea that experience cannot be reduced to the smallest observable events, then added back up again to constitute a life; that there is, on the contrary, an irreducible whole present in a life and at work through us. "Experience" concludes with Emerson's hallmark optimism, a faith in human events grounded in his sense of the total penetration of the divine in all matter. "Every day," he writes, and "every act betrays the ill-concealed deity," a determined expression of his lifelong principle that the divine radiates through all being.

The early 1850s saw the publication of a number of distinctively American texts: Nathaniel Hawthorne's The Scarlet Letter (1850); Melville's Moby-Dick (1851); Harriet Beecher Stowe’s Uncle Tom’s Cabin (1852); and Whitman’s Leaves of Grass (1855). Emerson's Representative Men (1850) failed to anticipate this flowering of a uniquely American literature in at least one respect: none of his representative characters were American—nevertheless, each biography yields an insight into some aspect of Emerson's thought he finds in the man or in his work, so that Representative Men reads as the history of Emerson’s precursors in other times and places. Emerson structures the book around portraits of Plato, the Swedish mystic Emmanuel Swedenborg, the French essayist Montaigne, the poet William Shakespeare, the statesman Napoleon Bonaparte, and the writer Johann Wolfgang von Goethe. Each man stands in for a type, for example, Montaigne represents the "skeptic," Napoleon the “man of the world.” Humanity, for Emerson, consisted of recognizable but overlapping personality types, types discoverable in every age and nation, but all sharing in a common humanity that has its source in divine being. Each portrait balances the particular feature of the representative man that illustrates the general laws inhabiting humanity along with an assessment of the great man's shortcomings. Like Nietzsche, Emerson did not believe that great men were ends in themselves but served particular functions, notably for Emerson their capacity to "clear our eyes of egotism, and enable us to see other people in their works." Emerson's representative men are "great,” but “exist that there may be greater men." As a gesture toward self-criticism about an entire book on great men by the champion of American individualism, Emerson concedes, "there are no common men," and his biographical sketches ultimately balance both the limitations of each man with his—to use an oxymoron—distinctive universality, or in other words, the impact he has had on Emerson's thought. While Plato receives credit for establishing the "cardinal facts . . . the one and the two.—1. Unity, or Identity; and, 2. Variety," Emerson concedes that through Plato we have had no success in "explaining existence." It was Swedenborg, according to Emerson, who discovered that the smallest particles in nature are merely replicated and repeated in larger organizations, and that the physical world is symbolic of the spiritual. But although he approves of the religion Swedenborg urged, a spirituality of each and every moment, Emerson complains the mystic lacks the "liberality of universal wisdom." Instead, we are “always in a church.” From Montaigne, Emerson gained a heightened sense of the universal mind as he read the French philosophers' Essays, for "It seemed to me as if I had myself written the book"—as well as an enduring imperative of style: "Cut these words, and they would bleed.” The “skeptic” Montaigne, however, lacks belief, which "consists in accepting the affirmations of the soul." From Shakespeare, Emerson received confirmation that originality was a reassembly of existing ideas. The English poet possessed the rare capacity of greatness in that he allowed the spirit of his age to achieve representation through him. Nevertheless the world waits on "a poet-priest" who can see, speak, and act, with equal inspiration." Reflection on Napoleon's life teaches the value of concentration, one of Emerson’s chief virtues. In The Conduct of Life, Emerson describes "concentration," or bringing to bear all of one's powers on a single object, as the "chief prudence." Likewise, Napoleon's shrewdness consisted in allowing events to take their natural course and become representative of the forces of his time. The defect of the "man of the world" was that he possessed “the powers of intellect without conscience" and was doomed to fail. Emerson's moral summary of Napoleon’s sounds a great deal like Whitman: "Only that good profits, which we can taste with all doors open, and which serves all men." Goethe, "the writer,” like Napoleon, represents the countervailing force of nature against Emerson's lifelong opponent, what he called "the morgue of convention." Goethe is also exemplary of the man of culture whose sphere of knowledge, as Emerson himself tried to emulate with his wide and systematic reading, knows no limits or categorical boundaries. Yet, "the lawgiver of art is not an artist," and repeating a call for an original relation to the infinite, foregoing even the venerable authority of Goethe, Emerson concludes, "We too must write Bibles."

English Traits was published in 1856 but represented almost a decade of reflections on an invited lecture tour Emerson made in 1847-48 to Great Britain. English Traits presents an unusually conservative set of perspectives on a rather limited subject, that of a single nation and "race," in place of human civilization and humanity as a whole. English Traits contains an advanced understanding of race, namely, that the differences among the members of a race are greater than the differences between races, but in general introduces few new ideas. The work is highly "occasional," shaped by his travels and visits, and bore evidence of what seemed to be an erosion of energy and originality in his thought.

The Conduct of Life (1860), however, proved to be a work of startling vigor and insight and is Emerson's last important work published in his lifetime. "Fate" is arguably the central essay in the book. The subject of fate, which Emerson defines as “An expense of means to end," along with the relation of fate to freedom and the primacy of man's vocation, come to be the chief subjects of the final years of his career. Some of Emerson's finest poetry can be found in his essays. In "Fate" he writes: “A man’s power is hooped in by a necessity, which, by many experiments, he touches on every side, until he learns its arc." Fate is balanced in the essay by intellect: "So far as a man thinks, he is free." Emerson's advice for the conduct of life is to learn to swim with the tide, to "trim your bark" (that is, sails) to catch the prevailing wind. He refines and redefines his conception of history as the interaction between "Nature and thought." Emerson further refines his conception of the great man by describing him as the “impressionable” man, or the man who most perfectly captures the spirit of his time in his thought and action. Varying a biblical proverb to his own thought, Emerson argues that what we seek we will find because it is our fate to seek what is our own. Always a moderating voice in politics, Emerson writes in "Power" that the “evils of popular government appear greater than they are”—at best a lukewarm recommendation of democracy. On the subject of politics, Emerson consistently posited a faith in balance, the tendencies toward chaos and order, change and conservation always correcting each other. His late aesthetics reinforce this political stance as he veers in "Beauty" onto the subject of women's suffrage: “Thus the circumstances may be easily imagined, in which woman may speak, vote, argue causes, legislate, and drive a coach, and all the most naturally in the world, if only it come by degrees."

In his early work, Emerson emphasized the operation of nature through the individual man. The Conduct of Life uncovers the same consideration only now understood in terms of work or vocation. Emerson argued with increasing regularity throughout his career that each man is made for some work, and to ally himself with that is to render himself immune from harm: "the conviction that his work is dear to God and cannot be spared, defends him." One step above simple concentration of force in Emerson's scale of values we find his sense of dedication: "Nothing is beneath you, if it is in the direction of your life." While in favor of many of the social and political reform movements of his time, Emerson never ventured far into a critique of laissez-faire economics. In "Wealth" we find the balanced perspective, one might say contradiction, to be found in all the late work. Emerson argues that to be a "whole man" one must be able to find a "blameless living," and yet this same essay acknowledges an unsentimental definition of wealth: “He is the richest man who knows how to draw a benefit from the labors of the greatest numbers of men." In the final essay of the book, "Illusions," Emerson uses a metaphor—“the sun borrows his beams”—to reassert his pervasive humanism, the idea that we endow nature with its beauty, and that man is at the center of creation. Man is at the center, and the center will hold: "There is no chance, and no anarchy, in the universe."

3. Legacy

Emerson remains the major American philosopher of the nineteenth century and in some respects the central figure of American thought since the colonial period. Perhaps due to his highly quotable style, Emerson wields a celebrity unknown to subsequent American philosophers. The general reading public knows Emerson's work primarily through his aphorisms, which appear throughout popular culture on calendars and poster, on boxes of tea and breath mints, and of course through his individual essays. Generations of readers continue to encounter the more famous essays under the rubric of "literature" as well as philosophy, and indeed the essays, less so his poetry, stand undiminished as major works in the American literary tradition. Emerson's emphasis on self-reliance and nonconformity, his championing of an authentic American literature, his insistence on each individual's original relation to God, and finally his relentless optimism, that "life is a boundless privilege," remain his chief legacies.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Baker, Carlos. Emerson Among the Eccentrics: A Group Portrait. New York: Penguin, 1997.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo: Essays and Lectures. Ed. Joel Porte. New York: Library of America, 1983.
  • Essays and Poems. Ed. Joel Porte et al. New York: Library of American, 1996.
  • The Complete Sermons of Ralph Waldo Emerson. Vol. 4. Ed Wesley T. Mott et al. Columbia, MO: University of Missouri Press, 1992.
  • The Selected Letters of Ralph Waldo Emerson. Ed. Joel Myerson. New York: Columbia, 1997.
  • The Heart of Emerson's Journals. Ed. Bliss Perry. Minneola, NY: Dover Press, 1995.
  • Field, Peter. S. Ralph Waldo Emerson: The Making of a Democratic Intellectual. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2002.
  • Porte, Joel. Representative Man: Ralph Waldo Emerson in His Time. New York: Columbia University Press, 1988.
  • Porte, Joel and Morris, Saundra. The Cambridge Companion to Ralph Waldo Emerson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Richardson, Robert D. Jr. Emerson: The Mind on Fire. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1995

Author Information

Vince Brewton
University of North Alabama
U. S. A.

Ethics and Phenomenology

Phenomenology is, generally speaking, a discipline that examines questions of metaphysics and epistemology. Insofar as ethics is usually seen as a topic apart from metaphysics and epistemology, it is thus not typically addressed by philosophers in the phenomenological tradition. However, there are important areas of overlap between ethics, metaphysics and epistemology, which may be fruitful points of departure for exploring a phenomenologically-oriented notion of ethics. In particular, metaphysics and epistemology seek to consider the validity of, among other ideas, analysis and wonder. An exploration of analysis and wonder can reveal the importance of ethics in this context. Once we have seen what follows from this standpoint, further consideration of ethics in terms of engineering will show how this standpoint can inform upon the world of praxis.

Table of Contents

  1. Theoretical Concerns
    1. Ethics Underlies Wonder and Analysis
    2. War
    3. Hospitals
    4. Ethics of Integration
    5. People
  2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World
    1. Overview
    2. Human Factors Engineering
    3. Phenomenology: Brentano
    4. Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl
    5. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Parallels
    6. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Enter Ethics
    7. Ethics as Homological
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Theory
    2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

1. Theoretical Concerns

a. Ethics Underlies Wonder and Analysis

Ethics can be seen as the foundation of wonder and analytic thought. First, existentialists accept wonder and deemphasize analysis, though phenomenologists tend to be more open to wonder and analytic thinking. Logical positivists and linguistic analysts see wonder as reducible to logic. Existentialists and phenomenologists are comfortable with ethics associated with wonder and analysis. Positivists and analysts deny ethics as an irreducible field of study. Ethicists would look at wonder to see if people need drugs in order to achieve states of euphoria or peace. Additionally, ethicists would take the same view about computers and analytic method.

In both instances, the question of ethics enters concerning more than the validity of wonder and analysis in the traditional philosophical sense (Kazanjian, 80; Buber, p. 11). Traditionally, existentialists and phenomenologists see wonder as revealing what "is." Analysis has almost no place in much of existentialism, and varying degrees of validity in phenomenology. Traditionally, linguistic analysts and logical positivists see nothing to be gained with wonder. Reality is language, and is to be analyzed, never something about which to wonder.

Ethics brings in a deeper issue in both instances. Even if wonder alone is valid, ought people use drugs to feel a sense of awe? Even if analysis alone can give access to reality, ought people simply resot to computers, the higher the speed the better, to understand what is?

Existential and phenomenological thinkers tell us that awe or wonder is the basis of analysis, or as pure wonder, may stand alone without cognition. Ethicists may argue that awe or wonder is a human trait and ought not require or involve drugs and surgical stimulation of the brain to induce a sense of wonder (Campbell, p. 163). Awe is basically the social, intersubjective reality of living in the world. Phenomenology calls the world the lived world instead of just the material, quantifiable world. This wonder is consciousness in the unaltered state. In this unaltered state, wonder is part of normal, lived, reality or existence.

Ethicists would say that linguistic analysis or logical positivism changes or distorts reality. Drugs and brain stimulation are not lived reality. They develop a state of artificial awe or wonder. If the unaltered mind uses logic alone to access reality, it may mean altering reality from what ought be to what artificially exists. If the person uses mind altering drugs to achieve awe or wonder, then the awe or wonder itself is altered, artificial, and unlived. We then see not the lived world, but the artificial world.

Phenomenology says we should not excarnate or take analysis out of the lived world. Phenomenological ethicists would say we should not excarnate wonder itself from the lived world. Thus, phenomenologists and existentialists would be medically, pharmaceutically, or biologically excarnating wonder or awe from the lived world, even if they refute positivism and analytics' portrayal of awe or wonder as wrong and insist on wonder or awe as revealing reality. The ethical position becomes a sociological view (Bryant, p. 1).

Paul Ricoeur (p. 217) looks at Cartesian dualism and says that we must overcome its excarnating of objectivity from the body. Non-biochemically, Ricoeur is criticizing Cartesian dualism for ignoring the embodiment of the objective. He is insisting that objectification must be done within the context of the lived world. We analyze the lived world or reduce it to quantities within the general framework of awe or wonder. Ricoeur's approach suggests that even logical positivism and linguistic analysis needs to look at the problem of excarnation. These movements are in the same category as Cartesian dualism when they consider analysis or reduction as without wonder, or devoid of the lived world.

The difference between logical positivism and analytic philosophy on the one hand, and Cartesian dualism on the other, rests with their views of reality. Dualism sees mind and body, or objectivity and subjectivity, as both real and valid. The problem is how to relate them. Positivism and analytic thinking argue that the lived world, subjectivity, wonder, awe, and so on do not exist as irreducible reality. They are totally reducible to the simples of fact.

Ricoeurian thinking contrasts with Cartesian dualism and with positivism and analytic philosophy by saying all three movements should see themselves as having wrongly excarnated object from the lived world. An ethics approach to wonder, however, goes deeper than Ricoeur. The ethicist would insist that we cannot justify wonder for the sake of wonder. We need to look at how we approach wonder or awe. Saying that the lived world and wonder are important is not sufficient. Arguing against positivist and analytic reductionism of wonder to facts is only partly correct. How we define the biochemical context of wonder is critical.

In ethics, we may wonder by being conscious and not taking drugs to alter the brain. People look around them, or they inquire, or meditate, and feel it crucial to feel a sense of wonder that beings "are." We wonder by ourselves, without bio-physiological intervention. Indeed, we do not need to take an aspirin or other legal medication to feel as sense of relaxation, calm, or rest. Beyond this, ethics says we ought not feel it important or in any way justified to take any illegal drugs that might induce a "high." The biochemical high or awe is indeed a biochemical reduction or analytic approach to wonder. This approach would assume that the state of wonder is primarily, perhaps exclusively, a chemical reaction within the brain, and has little to do with normal, non-biochemical experiences of the lived world. In other words, the biochemical approach to wonder suggests that we wonder not through existing, but primarily through changing the chemistry of the brain.

Ethics might call the biochemical approach to wonder as biochemical, pharmaceutical, or otherwise physiological positivism or analysis. Ironically and unfortunately, this becomes serious to the point where no real inquiry, not even traditional logical positivism and analytic thinking is possible. An ethicist might ask us to look at a piece of analytic literature or philosophy. We see symbols, diagrams, and virtually mathematical methods for attempting to determine resolutions to questions and problems. The analytic thinker, the positivist, would argue that they are coming near to solving issues, and that these solutions or clarifications reveal a reality devoid of wonder.

The ethics approach notes that these analytic and positivist thinkers are consciously engaging in intellectually work. They converse with each other, perhaps argumentatively with existentialists and phenomenologists, but always are participating in some kind of control over what they are doing. Their brains are functioning without medication or alteration. Now, the ethicists will point out, consider the biochemically activated phenomenologist or existentialist. In other words, we no longer just speaking of the positivist and analytic thinker inquiring without drugs. We are no longer speaking of positivists and analytic thinkers trying to totally reduce wonder to facts in terms of normal, not medicated activity. What the ethicist criticizes is the phenomenologist or existentialist who is defending wonder through druges. This person is criticizing positivism and analysis for trying to totally non-biochemically reduce wonder or awe to atomism. Yet, the phenomenologist and existentialist is defending irreducibility by feeling wonder, perhaps even attempting writing if that is possible, by consuming biochemicals which will induce the sense of oneness or awe (Eliade, p. 31).

In effect, the phenomenologist or existentialist has become a de facto positivist or analytic thinker. The phenomenologist or existentialist becomes a biochemical phenomenologist or existentialist, totally reducing the chemistry of the brain, body, and lived world to atoms and chemical reactions. If it is possible, the ethicist calls this positivistic or analytic phenomenology or existentialism. On the other hand, for clarification, the ethicist might use another term: biochemical phenomenology or existentialism.

b. War

What of the analytic thinker or positivist using computers for their approaches? Ethics would point to the efforts by analytic thinkers during World War II to crack Hitler's Enigma Machine code. The machine worked strictly through symbols. Codes are symbols. During WWII the codes were relatively complex, but speed was crucial in breaking them. Today, and in the future, with cryptology becoming increasingly sophisticated, codes become more complex, and the speed required to break them more crucial.

Positivists and analysts would insist that their philosophy requires respect, and faster computers. Ethicists would argue that we need a better world where criminals and dictators are minimized, and their powers decapitated. Having the computer capabilities of speedier problem-solving does not "solve" the problem in its widest sense. The problem in its widest sense is that people, usually the leaders, go bad and make evil things happen in the world. When governments ignore the rise of evil, they usually invite international catastrophes such as the Second World War. As the war occurs, and as the innocent attempt to now fight and defeat the enemy, many on the side of the innocent take pride in their technical efforts.

Technical abilities helped our side win against Hitler in his efforts to communicate through codes. None of this would have had to occur if we had kept him from rising to power in the first place. His rise to power, and the unethical ways we ignored his ascension were key to the disaster of the Second World War. We ignored his actions against Jews and non-Jews. This ignorance was unethical. We sat back and did nothing.

Toward the end, we began panicking and wondered how to solve problems to end the war. One major answer was to break his coding abilities. Fortunately, we broke his code, and this helped us win the war.

Today, intelligence agencies are increasingly positivistic in their coding/decoding efforts. Computers are the foundations of coding/decoding. Speed is paramount. We spend money, lots of it, in developing ways of surreptitiously monitoring telecommunications to determine what potential terrorists are saying. Technology is advancing rapidly in our endeavors to translate foreign and English conversations to determine whether speakers are planning attacks.

Forgotten in all this rush to technologize existence, society ignores the ethical grounds of analysis and computers (Stine, 141). We forget that analysis is embodied in wonder, and that thinking and wonder involve the ethical orientation. Are we ignoring the poor, the economically and socially deprived, the underprivileged? We no doubt are ignoring the impoverished. Then, in the event that the impoverished seek ways of retaliating, we suddenly seeks technical ways of speedier discovery of the terrorists' plots.

Even when terrorists are wealthy, we seek to look the other way instead of considering their moral deviancy and their ongoing hatred of humanity, especially of the West. We let this hatred grow, assuming that we do not initially deny it. As their hatred grows, it can mushroom into attacks against the West or even people in other cultures. Only then, in post 9/11 fashion, do we react and seek the speediest computers to analyze terrorist activities and conversations.

Ethics is derived from ethos or people. Any human activity must be seen within the social context. Thinking and wonder are among the fundamental human activities. Relegating cognition to the sum total of data becomes anti-human; similarly, relegating wonder to the realm of intravenous or other methods of drug intake is no longer a human activity. The ethos orientation of cognition means that thought, contrary to what Descartes said, is embodied and of social perspective. Cognition is never disembodied. To disembody cognition is to commit two wrongs.

One wrong is to seek cognition as devoid of awe. This makes thought sterile and dehumanizing. The second wrong is to see disembodied cognition as part of a technology where speed is the only way to resolve problems and answer questions.

Awe or wonder is the pre-cognitive requisite of the cognitive. Yet, ethics notes that we cannot stop there. Wonder cannot be an end in itself. If wonder is derived from a natural, non-drug induced sequence whereby we simply wonder that things "are," then we are practicing true awe. Once we take drugs or otherwise stimulate the brain to induce wonder, than the wonder is unethical. It is mechanical rather than emerging from ethos.

c. Hospitals

Take the example of a hospital's intensive care unit. Patients are put on a respirator to help them breathe. They may also be put on intravenous feeding so that the body can be "fed" nutrients mechanically instead of taking in food through the mouth. In time, however, society believes that such patients may be retained on such mechanical devices only if their physical conditions warrant such technologization. The purpose of life is for the patient to be helped toward normalcy. In this case, the patient must be helped to leave the hospital and eat and breathe, and so on, on their own.

The objective of life, of the hospital, is never to merely have the patients remain in intensive care, or even in the hospital. People need to be active in daily life, eating, breathing, and so on on their own. To eat and breathe on their own means dining and respiring as part of society, with one's own bodily abilities. Food is irreducible to nutrients. Breathing is irreducible to oxygen intake. Food and respiration emerge from the ethos, from the ethical. As biological as eating and breathing, they are not merely physical processes.

For example, the nervous person, the seriously emotionally troubled individual, will have difficulty eating and breathing. Human activity such as eating and breathing are as much part of the ethos or ethical, as they are physical, neurochemical, and so on. Indeed, eating disorders such as those resulting in being overweight, imply reducing food to merely physical entities being "put into the mouth." Eating does not mean simply stuffing the mouth, eating quickly, or any other physical process. Dining is a cultural, ethical process.

Similarly, we do not just respire by hyperventilating. We breathe by inhaling and exhaling normally, often unconsciously. Perons inhaling too fast may be suffering from an emotional problem, or perhaps physical difficulty. Persons inhaling and exhaling too fast are behaving unethically, anti-ethos or different from normal human activity.

We can say the same about wonder and analysis. Wonder is something we sense under normal human conditions without mechanical assistance. Drugs ought not play part of wonder.

Analysis is an activity in which we participate without the aid of computers, and hopefully within the context of wonder. To think analytically is to take apart. But to spend our time only taking apart means that we are simply assuming that words, pictures, behavior, and so on are only to be taken apart and never appreciated as products of the ethos or community. Taking apart ought mean that something was initially a whole. That wholeness cannot be violated. If we emphasize the taking apart aspect of existence, and reject or ignore the synthetic and the wonderful, we have relegated existence to a form of hospitalization, to a form of the intensive care unit.

Existence is not meant to be only analyzed, and it is not meant to be only wondered. Ethos means that analysis and wonder go hand in hand. Analysis and wonder are not mutually exclusive. We never merely analyze without some wonder, and never wonder by merely mechanical means. Both analysis and wonder reflect an ethical, social, cultural dimension.

Feminism can be helpful here. Feminists argue that nothing written is ever totally objective, and devoid of the cultural. Look at books. Their authors are not just "authorities," but traditionally have been white males. Their subject matter, too, have typically ignored injustices toward women. Sexism means that we have looked at women simply as reducible to anatomy, and never as human beings. Ethics means that women are human beings, irreducible to physical characteristics.

Racial theory can also help. Racism has meant that authorities writing books have been white males. But the ethical thrust of the women's’ movement and racial justice has attempted to bring about a better, ethos oriented vision. We now have books and articles written by women, and by nonwhite males. Authors are not just authors. They are a racial-gender-human continuum. No author is the sum total of racial, religious, biological, and other parts. Every author is first of all a human being.

Wonder and analysis, then, are irreducible to mechanical identification. Persons need to be able to wonder with only their mind and body, in awe of the universe or of any particular event. They need only to analyze within the context of this natural wonder, and with computers only on a limited scale.

Ethics does not demand the exclusion of computers from society. The ethos orientation requires only that computing, speed, technology, and other quantification occur within the context of a healthy environment. The idea of proactivity or prevention is important here.

Proactivity means we need to prevent rather than react to bad events. Before illness strikes, we need to monitor physical and other conditions resulting in disease. Ethics means we ought not ignore health dangers, and then react medically, physically, surgically, to "solve" unhealthy situations. Drugs, whether over the counter or prescription, do not need to take the place of a healthy lifestyle and diet. People might need to depend on drugs as they age and their body deteriorates. Even then, they must take drugs only by doctor's orders, and never simply because the drugs are there.

The preventative, proactive approach to health includes habits of proper diet, exercise, monitoring stress, wearing clothes appropriate to the season, air conditioning during the summer and heat during the winter. These measures and lifestyles help insure that people will not get ill to the extent that they can have some reasonable control over life. Illness can and will come under many circumstances. Viruses, bacteria, many forms of sickness will emerge regardless of what we do to prevent illness.

When illness does come, we need to take a look at the best ways of curing what we have, and returning to a relative healthy state. Physicians may often examine patients and tell them than rest, proper diet, the drinking of fluids, and so on, will probably help bring the patients back to health. Not all diseases require medication. Additionally not all diseases require surgery. Even broken bones may not require cutting the patient. In time, many bones will heal correctly if their break is not in a physical position to cause deformity when healed.

Medicine, then, often seeks to prevent illness through a healthy lifestyle. When medical treatment is needed, pills are often preferable to surgery. Similar approaches are sought by ethicists for awe and analysis.

Wonder and analytic thinking are never mutually exclusive. Existence does not consist of wonder devoid of analysis, or analysis and rational-sensory approaches lacking awe. Most importantly, phenomenological ethics means that wonder and analysis are not to be merely the ends in themselves. We cannot say that because we are analyzing within the context of wonder, we are therefore being ethical, appropriately intellectual and properly in awe.

The states of awe and analysis are human states. They are irreducible to mechanical, physical, neurophysiological methods. Before we consider being in awe as a context for being analytical, we need to realize the need for being ethical, social, humane. Ethics is more than doing right and avoiding wrong in daily activity, business ventures, and the professions. Ethical behavior is basic to cognitive efforts to understand reality. The drug culture of the 1960s assumed that achieving a "high" was very important, but could not be reached until persons smoked pot or did hard drugs to alter the mind.

Similarly, people who believe in the rational approach to existence frequently misinterpret rationalism, logic, calculation, and speed. They too often assume that the logical or rational sequences are only sequences depending on speed. Their view is that speed is fundamental, and therefore the faster a sequence the better. From that view, the quicker we gather and understand greater numbers of variables or parts of the problem, the better our solution.

An unethical view of problem solving involves quick technical solutions to a given problem. A problem can be small or large. Instead of asking ourselves whether the problem is real or not, we frequently tell ourselves that speedy solutions are the answer. For example, take urban crime. We see robbers, burglars, car thieves. We hear of homicides and arsonists. Our typical approach is to assume that crime is crime, and its solution is a nonsocial, purely professional response from the police. The more police the better. The faster our calls are answered, and the quicker the police arrive at the scene, the better we feel that the problem of criminality is being solved.

This unethical view says that more crime we have, the more and faster police response we need. That view also suggests that the faster we get fingerprints and identify the wrongdoer, the more our society is progressing. Our emphasis is on speed, imprisonment or worse, technology, and other mechanical forms of reaction.

The ethical approach is fundamentally different. We would give opportunities to young people in order to attract them to productive lives outside crime. Families need strengthening, discipline must be practiced and taught, neighborhoods aware of wrongdoing, parental responsibility required. Our social institutions must be upheld. Churches, social groups, schools, governmental organizations, hospitals, and all businesses will need to work together. The police are there, but cannot be the only people combating crime. Technology ought be there, but only within the context of the social structures.

Society ought not ignore the social conditions and then go after the criminals arising as a result of deteriorating cultural situations. Culture is the not only contributor to crime. Some people simply may be born trouble makers. A weak social structure lets them do as they please until it is too late. Simply waiting for people to become criminals, then going after them, arresting, taking them to trail, and locking them up are the mechanical ways of recidivism.

The ethical approach attempt to return the criminal to society through rehabilitation when initial parenting or habilitation has failed. We cannot just let young people grow up doing as they please, and then throw the book at them when they go wrong. Society seems to like the mechanical approach to most things. In medicine and health, we increase emergency rooms. In law enforcement, we want more and faster police. Education becomes a mechanical method of learning from computers. Transportation develops into a way of speedier, aircraft, and automobiles even if we need to build bigger airports, and destroy ecology with more highways. Information becomes merely a commodity where we transmit data and receive it with greater efficiency. In more and areas, technology and rapidity of getting something or someone from here to there becomes paramount. Ethically, medicine must involve better health habits, law enforcement better homes, love, and discipline, learning a matter of student teacher interaction, travel a matter of bicycles and trains, and information an issue of understanding and social empathy.

d. Ethics of Integration

Wonder and analysis are good when they are integrated. We cannot have just wonder, or only analysis. Yet, integrated or not, wonder must come from within and never as a result of drugs and electrical stimulation of the brain. Analysis must be within the social context and never merely a computerized battle toward solutions. Phenomenological ethics shows awe to be the view that things are fundamentally one, and culturally uplifting. Basic to all is our wonder that reality is a beautiful, awesome, non-problematic existence.

Existence is more than just a problem to be solved, a difficulty to be overcome. Existing ought mean appreciating life, people, God, culture, and all plants and animals. We cannot just look at the world as an ongoing defect to be repaired. Life may have evil in it, but is not essentially evil. It is a wondrous reality. This view is available to us not just through drugs, but our very natural feeling of awe. Again, good parenting and better social structure can contribute to or take away from this feeling.

Albert Einstein displayed ethics when he told his fellow scholars at Princeton to stop by an say hello from time to time. Most scholars were shocked. They felt that Princeton was a place for intellectual discourse instead of chit chat and normal conversation. They felt even more strongly that Einstein's work was so critical that they did not wish to interfere in his studies with what they consider small talk or any conversation irrelevant to scientific work.

We think of Einstein as a scientist. He was clearly displaying what phenomenology calls intersubjectivity and wonder as the basis of any scientific work. Einstein believed that normal human beings, even those in intensive scholarly research, needed and should engage in the wonder of interpersonal, face to face community that this the social foundations of any verbal communications. Community is the basis of communications. We cannot communicate or convey information from person to person unless we first establish of acknowledge what phenomenology calls the "given" community or lived world.

e. People

In phenomenological ethics, we are first, last, and always in the community of people, in intersubjectivity, wonder, awe, or the non-cognitive. We are one with vegetation, with nature, with spiritual powers or religious dimensions. The term "people like us" is not to be taken as meaning individuals of our race, creed, color, or gender. It is to be interpreted as meaning that all human beings in the world are like each other. People are the same, regardless of race, creed, and so on.

Wonder means that all things are essentially related with each other. We do not first sense races, creeds, religions, and genders, and then arrive, step by step, to our humanity. The first thing we sense is that all individuals are alike. Races, religions, and so on are differentiations that we tend to make in distinguishing each other. Wonder makes it clear that whatever else we have as differences, human beings are, at bottom, the same.

Only within the context of fundamental awe of the unity of all things, do we then take apart or analyze people from each other, animals, nature, and so on. Analysis, done within awe, is benign. Analysis done outside the framework of wonder becomes mere taking apart of the essentially unified. In this sense, analysis becomes mere destruction.

Wonder and analysis in the ethical perspective comprise our intersubjective, sensory, rational unity. This occurs only when awe and analytic thinking occur within the context of the ethic or ethos: culture. Human beings are meant to awe that they are in the unified world of people, animals, vegetation and nature. Nothing is or ought be totally objectified. We are meant also to differentiate or analyze carefully in order to understand and intellectually cope with the existing world. Within awe, we objectify in order to develop an intellectual stance about why things are as they are.

Intersubjectivity and objectivity go hand in hand. Intersubjectivity or wonder devoid of objectivity becomes dangerously anti-technology. Objectivity alone becomes anti-human. Ethics tells us that this integration is complete when we appreciate intersubjectivity through normal human activity and not through drugs. We need also appreciate objectivity through normal intellectual activity and never through seeing speed, technology, or quantification as an end in itself.

The awe of our being together as a basis for any technique in analyzing that intersubjectivity can be seen MIT's OpenCourseWare. Classroom learning with face to face interaction is fundamental to any distance learning. Wonder occurs not through mechanical activity but the social interaction found in the classroom; analysis is then found not through sophisticated telecourses, but computers existing and operating in the service and context of face-to-face interaction.

Alfred North Whitehead (p. 232) says that philosophy begins in wonder, and that wonder continues after philosophers have analyzed reality. Judith Boss says ethics begins in wonder. Philosophy can say that wonder and analysis begin with ethics, and that ethics continues as the context or orientation for analysis and wonder, and all activity.

2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

a. Overview

A key model that represents the way to tie phenomenological ethics to the world is by examining ethics, philosophy, and engineering. Scholars in the field of ethics would say that their field provides basic ideas unifying engineering and philosophy. Those thinkers who are ethicists would indicate that engineering and philosophy share a common ground in ethics. Engineering and philosophy are specific manifestation of ethics. The ethicist's position sees engineering and philosophy as fields where human beings and values orient technology, objectivity, reason, and logic.

Ethicists (Kazanjian, 1998, Chapter 2) would view ethics as unifying engineering and philosophy. Scholars in ethics would view their field as underlying the humanistic thinking in philosophy, and the scientific views of engineering. Those who study ethics would see ethical ideas as necessary in courses in virtually all disciplines and professions. These scholars see ethics as an interdisciplinary foundation to the arts and sciences. For ethicists, business ethics, legal ethics, medical and biomedical ethics, engineering ethics, are all integral parts of business, law, medicine, and the other disciplines. Those who are ethics scholars would say business ought engage in ethical instead of unethical practices. These ethicists would also see lawyers, physicians, biomedical researchers, engineers, and others as competent when their curriculum teaches them values and morals as well as technical expertise. Ethicists would say that values and morals orient technique. The ethical perspective sees the mechanics of a given field as ethically oriented. Ethics scholars would view any disciplinarian as a professional concerned with human beings instead of merely a cognitive or technical, non-ethical expert. Scholars from the field of ethics see their work as interdisciplinarity, among their tasks being the disclosure of the ethical basis of engineering and philosophy. As such, ethicists see their discipline as basic to liberal arts and sciences, and interdisciplinarity at any level.

b. Human Factors Engineering

Human factors engineering, also known as ergonomics or ergonomic engineering, is that kind of engineering which designs physical environments including machines and processes to match human limits and abilities, and train people to use those environments (Chapanis, p.534; Kantowicz and Sorkin, p. 20). These engineers work with mathematics, physics, chemistry, and often computers. Beyond these scientific and technical fields, ergonomics engineers deal with human beings. These engineers are concerned not only with how to design an environment, but how to design it to be safe for the user.

The ergonomics position sees safety as meaning that engineers ought design the environments to be user friendly and ought avoid both user unfriendly and user too friendly designs (Adams, p. 256). A design that is user unfriendly ignores the user. To be user unfriendly means is a design whereby the machine or process is dangerous or offensive for the user. The other design is user too friendly, whereby the machine or process is so safe as to be rendered unfunctional. Designing something as user friendly means that users are able to work with an environment which takes into account the users' limits and abilities. Such limits and abilities mean people have arms, legs, eyes, ears, and torsos with certain anatomic and sensory measurements. Arms bend in certain ways and are of certain lengths. The same with legs. Ears hear best at certain sound levels. We see best at certain distances.

Ergonomics is saying that human beings see, hear, and move within certain physical parameters. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on. Any machine or process ought be designed such that it allows the user to use it comfortably, without undue stress or tension. Designing user friendly machines or processes is right. Designing an environment that forces people to merely sense or move is wrong. At the other extreme, designing an environment so safe that users need not make any effort to learn or use it is also wrong. The system could become nonfunctional.

The typical human factors engineering text looks like a combination engineering, psychology, and biology book. Ergonomics engineers say that any physical environment is as much social and psychological as it is mathematical, physical, or chemical. No user friendly design is totally reducible to the sum of nuts and bolts. Human factors argues that objects and people comprise an interface: both are interrelated to each other. Machines/processes and human beings ought not be seen as mutually exclusive, but inherently human-oriented. Al Gini (p. 3) argues that work is vital to our identity, but it must be a humanizing career and never just meaningless, dehumanizing sum of tasks.

Human factors also rejects overemphasizing the user. If machines/processes are to take into account the user's abilities and limits, they are not to simply make things so safe and user-friendly that the machine/procedure becomes unfunctional or unable to perform its technical task.

c. Phenomenology: Brentano

Phenomenology is the philosophical movement somewhere between existentialism and logical positivism. Existentialists would see human beings or any aspect of reality almost totally irreducible to numbers or rational explanation, while the logical positivist position would view people and any reality as totally reducible to number and reason. The existential position views our social and cultural embodiment or existence is almost completely irreducible to number and reason, whereas logical positivism and linguistic analysis see our existence as basically, perhaps totally, rational and numeric. Brentano is considered the founder of phenomenology. He (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8) initiated the idea of intentionality. Intentionality means that consciousness or embodiment inherently relates to objects. Consciousness is consciousness of objects. Brentano attempted to overcome the logical positivist notion that objects and sensation are real, and consciousness is totally reducible to objectivity.

Brentano would see the thinking mind and the body mutually interrelated . He believed Cartesian dualism is wrong in stating that thinking and the body are two different entities. In speaking about the mind-body unity, Brentano set the stage for Husserl to develop phenomenology. Brentano spoke of the mind-body continuum and rejected total objectivity. Thinking is continuous or interrelated with the body. But Husserl more fully developed the continuum and rejecting two extremes: thinking alone or objectivism, and mere embodiment or subjectivism.

d. Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl

Edmund Husserl moved beyond Brentano (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8). Husserl sees a development of the mind-body continuum. Objectivity or mind is never value-free or disembodied, according to Husserl. All objectivity is value-laden or occurs as worldly, social, cultural. This view contrasts with the logical positivist notion that objectivity is the sole reality, and value-free.

Husserl's position would say objectivity ought be seen as reflecting or matching subjectivity or values. From the perspective of phenomenology, we must consider all phenomena as real that appear to consciousness or our thoughts. Where logical positivists and linguistic analysts, and all emotional terms such as God as poetry and not cognitively meaningful, phenomenologists believe all objectivity reflects subjectivity, culture, values, and ethics.

The phenomenological position sees the mind-body issue in the manner that people ought look at physical environments as continuous with subjectivity, and emotions and noncognitive ideas as the social milieu generating the meaning of physical environments. Phenomenologically, objects, cognition, and cultural artifacts are real: products of human or subjective intentions. Mathematics, physics, chemistry, computers, and all the arts and sciences must be seen as part of life. But these cognitive realities emerge from a social, subjective realm and are not to be divorced from human experience. Cognition is never reducible to numbers, symbols, sense perception, and other non-emotive reality. Words reflect human experiences as a whole.

The position of phenomenology is that objectivity to be value-laden and ought avoid two extremes. One extreme is value-free cognition. This is cognition whereby cognition or any object is seen as free of any emotive or cultural values or spirituality. The other extreme means extreme existentialism that rejects any reducibility. Here, science, technology and any cognitive effort is considered almost anti-human. Phenomenology sees cognition and physical environments as things that take into account our values and any other noncognitive being. People have cognitive and analytical abilities and ought use them in certain ways. Knowing is not a simple matter of sense perception and analysis. The blanket denial of the reality of noncognitive ideas such as God and values suggests too simplistic a means of getting at reality.

Husserl also rejects subjectivism or solipsism. In saying that everything appearing to consciousness is real, critics argues that he was dangerous near, if not in fact, advocating solipsism. However, Husserl reject both logical positivism's cold objectivism, which says people are objects and values unreal, and extreme existentialism and subjectivism's solipsism, which maintains that the self is the only reality.

Phenomenology: Alfred Schutz (p. 140) comes from the perspective of applied phenomenology. Specifically, his viewpoint is sociology. He considers sociology as the study of "lived history," or human institutions within which we find chronological or day to day history. He points out that human beings see, hear, and move within value parameters. Social structures comprise "lived history," and are the context within which "chronological history" makes sense. Schutz ideas are similar to those of Kenneth Boulding. Boulding, while not technically a phenomenologist, notes that perception and action occur within our images of wholes, and never as the sensing of raw data or merely mechanical anatomic movement. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on.

In phenomenology, consciousness intends or is consciousness of objects, thus revealing a subject-object continuum. Objectivity, perception and movement, in turn, are colored by our values and lived world. Objectivity is continuous with subjectivity. Subjectivity is never the reality of just one person, but intersubjective or social. Thus, phenomenology rejects the existential notion of extreme individuality or the virtually solipsistic ego.

Reality, in phenomenology, is the subject-object continuum or duality. Phenomenologists say we ought avoid Cartesian dualism of the mutually exclusive mind and body. Consciousness is always of the object, and the object is always embodied. Ricoeur (p. 217) argues that phenomenology overcomes Cartesian dualism by reintroducing the excarnate mind into the carnate or body. His efforts enable phenomenology to resolve dualism, as well as the objectivism of positivism, and subjectivism of existentialism.

The mind-body continuum means that subjectivity and objectivity are both real, but comprise a systematic reality instead of parts being real in themselves. Human beings exist in a world of physical reality. We sense this as we consider the lived world of culture giving meaning to material objects and generating ideas. Subjectivity does not exist alone; it requires a object. Likewise, objectivity is not merely "out there;" it is always perceived within cultural, lived orientations.

The phenomenological view is that subjectivity is never devoid of objectivity, while the solipsistic position entails subjectivity as devoid of objectivity. We need the world, for people are part of physical reality. Interpreting objectivity as devoid of subjectivity is similarly wrong. It becomes a dehumanized objectivity disregarding human beings and consciousness. Along these lines and seemingly less serious a problem, dualism is just as wrong, according to phenomenology. Objects and subjects are irreducible to mutual distinct, inherently unrelated entities. We do not just take discreet objectivity and subjectivity and externally juxtapose them. We would be unable to bridge the subject-object gap if it were intrinsically discontinuous or unbridged.

e. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Parallels

Human factors engineering and phenomenology appear to be mutually distinct fields. One is engineering and quantitative, the other a philosophical movement rejecting total quantification. As such, engineering and phenomenology would seem to be irreconcilable disciplines: engineering being strictly hard culture, phenomenology fundamentally soft culture. But our brief statements above show something else.

A glance at human factors engineering and phenomenology reveals parallels. Human factors believes that all physical environment interface with people. Objects ought be designed as continuous with human operators. The entire system is a machine-person interface or continuum, instead of the machine being something totally objective and non-personal. Phenomenology says that mind or objectification is continuous with the social dimension. Phenomenologists speak of the mind-body continuum. Human factors could speak of the machine-user continuum, phenomenology of the mind-body interface. Human factors would be saying machines are continuous with the user, phenomenology would be indicating that the mind interrelates with the body. In ergonomics, seeing designs or actual machines means seeing the operator or subjectivity. In phenomenology, seeing words on paper must mean seeing human values and other intangibles. For human factors engineers, machines/processes ought be acknowledged as intrinsically continuous or interfacing with people's physical, social, and psychological limits. In phenomenology, the written word ought be recognized as inherently continuous with values and other cultural themes underlying the empirical.

Human factors says machines/processes ought be user-friendly, and ought not be user-unfriendly. Phenomenology maintains that objectivity ought be seen as value-laden, and never value-free. By user friendly, human factors means buttons, numbers, levers, lights, and other physical apparatus the operations and reasons of which the user can learn relatively easily, and the use of which will not harm the person. The human being need not be the proverbial rocket scientist to understand these operations; training would not require the typical user to earn a Ph.D., or even take one course from MIT. The user also need not be made of steel or physically qualify for Navy SEAL commando work to use the environment. The user friendly environment is designed for the typical person's intellectual and physical abilities. By value-laden, phenomenology means any word ultimately reflects human values. No word is or can be value-free, as the philosophical movements logical positivism and .linguistic analysis tend to maintain. Positivists and analytic thinkers argue that words such as God, love, and religion do not belong in intellectual discourse because they reflect values and emotion. Words such as chair, table, atom and other words are value-free and non-emotive. However, chair reflects the English language, can imply the electric chair, can mean a department head at a college or university, and appears to be nonsexist relative to the apparently sexist term chairman. Phenomenologists would maintain that no word is value-free, that every term is a sociology of that term. Every word emerges from and reflects the social and cultural framework that produces it.

A user unfriendly environment is totally objective, ignoring human limits and abilities and forcing people to mere push, pull, and perceive. Al Gini (p. 120) notes that work offering no hope and becoming unethical is wrong, and means roughly what ergonomics means by user unfriendly work. Value-free language would mean a totally objective set of words over which there is no debate. However, every math, computer, physics and other science book or piece of literature reflects a human author and the author's perspective, slant, or view. Feminism and civil rights thinkers have shown that such books (any book) are value-laden whether we like it or not. Each is written by a white male, black male, Latino woman, or person of a particular religious, ethnic, or sexual orientation. An author lacking ethnic, gender, and similar human qualities is impossible.

Human factors could say machines ought be user-laden, while phenomenologists might indicate that objectivity ought be seen as subject-friendly. The human factors term "user" is synonymous with phenomenology's term “subject.” User and subject mean the human being and the cultural context from which the human being emerges.

Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at human-made environments as reflecting culture and not as just cognitive, scientific, or merely objective fields of study and work. Moreover, both ergonomics and phenomenology consider the human as part of the object. Thus, ergonomics notes that we ought avoid simply catering to the person's every desire and want, and phenomenology rejects solipsism's view that the individual is the sole reality.

f. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Enter Ethics

The previous section notes the technical parallels between ergonomics and phenomenology. Readers will see the term "ought" throughout the paragraphs.

Phenomenology and human factors have fundamental parallels, as indicated in the previous section. These are intellectual or technical similarities. They indicate that both see a unity of objects and people.

In doing so, they are ethical in the general sense. Both machines and rational thought emerge from the social context. Ergonomics argues that machines reflect the social and cultural milieu, and are not totally reducible to nuts and bolts. Phenomenologists (Stewart and Mikunas, p. 10) note that God, love, anger, desire, and other intangibles are real because they appear to consciousness. Secular phenomenologists consider nonreligious themes as real. Religious phenomenologists believe that theological and spiritual notions such as God are real.

Both human factors experts and phenomenologists deny that sensation is our only way of knowing and experiencing. Ergonomics engineers would say it is wrong or unethical to design a machine or process that has operators simply "look," “hear,” or otherwise sense a control panel or other part of a machine. Phenomenologists argue that we would be outside the ethos or culture if we considers human behavior or reality as strictly sensory phenomena.

Engineers abide by and study professional ethics, and the Occupational Safety and Health Administration monitors dangerous in the workplace according to federal law. Phenomenology, however, does not become part of a professional ethics issue except in the case of the ethics of teaching. It may seem that in phenomenology, the subject-object discontinuity or dichotomy is only an academic rather than a technically ethical matter as in engineering. To say that objects are disconnected from and do not reflect subjectivity is not an ethical matter.

Phenomenology is concerned with ethics in the broad sense of ethos or culture. Totally reducing knowledge or reality to the empirical means excarnating or taking sensation out of the social realm comprising ethos. In applied phenomenology, reducing people to computerized forms, numbers, and related paper work may be seen an unethical or socially undesirable.

In acknowledging the social and psychological as well as physical side of people, both human factors engineering and phenomenology are rooted in the sociology of human-made products. A sociology of work suggests that people do not just "do." They do and know within social, ethos, and thereby ethical constraints.

Both human factors engineering and phenomenology share the view that the person or subject is not alone. In ergonomics, machines ought take the user into account, but this does not mean that the design reflect everything about the user. Physical environments should not be so designed as to satisfy every want, desire, and whim of the operator. Operators need to be trained, and put forth effort to realize that the environment requires change on the users' part. Additionally, operators are continuous with their surroundings. They are not Luddites, working or existing alone, without the use of physical environments. Phenomenology says that subjectivity is not the same as subjectivism. In subjectivism, the self is considered to be alone, devoid of objectivity.

Phenomenology seems not to fall into the same ethics category of including punishments for unethical behavior as does human factors engineering. However, the culture that supports a totally dehumanized attitude toward people, such as allowing computerization to go wild and reduce everyone to numbers in every instance, is manifesting an anti phenomenological view. The positivism attitude is that we merely know and are excarnated from feelings and emotions. No ethical ruling can be made against positivism as an intellectual movement Yet positivism reflects the culture view that we can and ought ignore feeling and other intangibles.

The lived world is phenomenology's notion that people live, work, and play in a social context where not everything is totally reducible to numbers or is effable. Paul Ricouer tells us that Cartesian dualism is the effort to see the world and the mind as two different substances. The Cartesian world-view means that cognition is excarnate, discontinuous with the body. Positivism argues that the cognitive is all there exists. Ricoeur would want us to reintroduce the cognitive into the lived world, and to see cognition as incarnate or embodied.

Broadly speaking, the embodied viewpoint is the ethos-oriented viewpoint whereby cognitive activity emerges from the parameters of culture. People ought not just think. Basically, they never just think. Thus, no individual ought take the stand that we are simply thinking substances, whether this substance is somehow related to the body in dualistic terms, or stands by itself in positivistic notions. On the other hand, the cognitive is part of life. We ought not consider the reductive or cognitive as unwarranted, as in much existentialism. We certainly ought not take the view that the cognitive does not have a reality, that the self is alone, that each of us is isolated.

The ethical view posits a holistic perspective. Objectification ought be seen as interfacing or being continuous with the subject or intersubjectivity. Neither objectification devoid of subjectivity, nor subjectivity without objectivity, is the ought.

Human factors speaks of groups of users, not just a user, as reference for designing machines. Phenomenology speaks of intersubjectivity, not just of one subject, a reference for seeing the cognitive. Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at individuals as social, and their limits and abilities are pertaining to groups rather than to one or two people.

Phenomenological thinkers take the position that could be interpreted as the philosophical version of ergonomics. In ergonomics, we do not hear of linguistic analysis, logical positivism , or existentialism. Yet, Ergonomics reveals or deals with language in the broadest sense. When ergonomics speaks of people seeing, hearing, touching, pulling, they are using language. In saying that a person is something that simply sees, hears, etc., we are being positivistic and reducing the individual to an object. If we agree that users are human beings who see, hear, and otherwise sense and move within emotive, cultural, and physical contexts, we are then thinking or using language from a phenomenological viewpoint.

Traditional linguistic analysis tends to imply that philosophers in that vein are only thinkers and not fundamentally akin the engineering. An interdisciplinary attitude with a broad vision of language sees things differently. Language analysts in philosophy work with symbolic logic and not technical mathematics. Human factors engineers work with mathematics, but are suggesting that people are indeed at least partly physical, sensory, and material. Ergonomics may be called human factors, but it can also be called subjectivity factors: we need to take the subjective and cultural into account for engineering processes.

As a corollary, the phenomenological position would be that human factors considers users as not mere objects, but that any characteristic of the person that appears to consciousness is a valid reality. Thus, engineers who are only nuts and bolts people traditionally say we are only skin, neurons, senses, and bones. This is very positivistic language. Phenomenologically, users are also values, emotions, spirituality, and ethos as a whole. Human factors and phenomenology are looking at operators as fundamentally human beings with dignity and essentially irreducible qualities.

Logical positivists might argue that their members helped win World War II by cracking Hitler's Enigma Machine code. This is true. On the more fundamental side, Hitler would not have risen to the powerful level that we allowed to him to do so had we been phenomenological and cultural. As he was rising and accumulating power, a cultural view would have told us to stop him in his tracks. Had we done so, war would have been unnecessary, the Normandy invasion would not have had to occur, and Hitlers codes would not have had time to develop to be used against us.

Ethics tells us that human factors and phenomenology speak the same language, though ergonomics is the trained engineer designing machines, and phenomenologists are philosophers trained in inquiry and argument instead of the design of physical environments. Physical environments are but a form of language. Ergonomics and phenomenology speak the same language in terms of acknowledging that objectivity is subject- or value-oriented. Al Gini speaks of work in terms of business ethics: work must be ethical and never unethical.

They speak the same language in saying that human beings are essential social instead of standing alone. The physical, written, and motor environments are never totally reducible to objects "out there." But as reflections of human beings, these environments mirror "our" and not “my” world. Any human value represents the share world-view of numerous individuals comprising a group. Language ought never be either completely symbolic as in the totally logical methods of linguistic analysis, nor ought it be simply one person's language which no other person can understand.

Two people, one a human factors engineer, the other a phenomenologist, can look at a machine or consider a procedure. These two individuals can communicate with each other if they understand their shared viewpoint. Both are coming from the ethical perspective. The engineer is saying that the numbers, words, and motions, which is to say, the language, of a system, ought reflect human beings in light of culture. A phenomenologist is saying that the writings in a human factors text ought reflect the social, psychological and related value-oriented words and meanings we see in culture.

Both the ergonomics and phenomenological philosopher would agree that the human values comprise a share enterprised that reflects the objective world continuous with the cultural milieu. No person is an island, no person is reducible to flesh and bones. Somewhere between extreme individualism and mere objectivism, the subject-object continuum or machine-person interface comprises a reality including the validity of external and internal worlds.

Ethics means objects are the externalizing of human ideas and the validity of the outside world. As ethos, we are neither extra-ethos nor merely ethos. The extra-ethos or extra-ethical suggests that people are sensations and motions; the merely ethos or ethical can mean we are only a commune, only a community doing little or nothing. Pushed to the extreme, the commune leads to the individual member as possibly believing that he or she stands alone.

In both human factors and phenomenology, language as our fundamental nature is seen as an object-subjective reality. Positivism sees language as symbols and sensory activity; traditional engineering involving merely nuts and bolts sees machines, and therefore language, as the sum total of physical parts. Human factors and phenomenology, rooted in ethos, consider language as a holistic reality whereby being serves to objectify itself through beings.

g. Ethics as Homological

We typically think of ethics as a course of study, as in professional or philosophical ethics. In that way, ethics is no more fundamental than any other discipline. The above pages show that ethics is isomorphic or homological. Isomorphic is derived from iso meaning the same, and morphic meaning shape. Ethics is the same shape or principle that underlies ergonomics and phenomenology. Homological is derived from homo means same, and logic meaning word or structure. Ethics is the same structure from which ergonomics and phenomenology are derived. Learning ethics is basic to human factors engineering and phenomenology. As we consider ethics, we find it necessary to objectify within the parameters of culture, values, and perhaps spirituality. From the engineering perspective, ethics becomes a method of developing physical structures for human use. From the philosophical view, ethics can be interpreted as the intellectual inquiry into knowledge and reality.

As an isomorphic or homological root to human factors and phenomenology, ethics becomes the foundations for a liberal arts. Whatever we know and do, we are inherently facing the opportunity to know and do what is humane, and what is not. This opportunity means intellectual and engineering approaches are basically ethical. They emerge from culture or ethos. To deny values would be to reject our cultural foundations; to seek only values would be unrealistic.

Interdisciplinary research has gone in two directions. One is interdisciplinarity in the sense of team teaching and putting together courses and topics in some sort of seamless or minimally seamed fabric. Ethics plays an equity role here. It is one of the disciplines or ideas relevant to knowledge. The other direction (Kazanjian, 2002, p. 30) is more fundamental. This is the isomorphic direction. Isomorphic or homological ethics means that we must study ethics as a cultural, ethos framework within which we find the roots for all other professions.

Ethics as the homological root of numerous disciplines can thereby show us how to understand human factors engineering and phenomenology. Take ethics away from ergonomics and we essentially eliminate human factors engineering. The very term "human factor" implies that ethos is basic to engineering. Take ethics away from phenomenology and we basically have logical positivism. The subjective orientations of objectivity refer to the ethos from which emerges the objective.

Contemporary interest in professional ethics implies that ethical and non-ethical thinking and doing is something new. Indeed, our admission is new. The existence of the ethical perspective is as old as humanity. Mircea Eliade (p. 31) has taken pains to elucidate the validity of ethics in primitive cultures. In every society we have dos and don'ts. Without that view, any person in any culture will simply do or know, and the result could hurt that person or others.

Eliade's point concerns comparative religion. Ancient societies did everything by repeating the anatomic gestures as performed in Primordial Time by the gods. Primordial Time is the time before the gods created the world and our idea of calendar time. No member of any society simply "did" something. Today, we imply that we merely do or know. Even Eliade suggests that contemporary society is totally secularized. Yet, Clifton Bryant's research in the sociology of work (p. 1) catalogues the social and thus ethical directions of knowledge and technique.

Ethics, then, is not just another topic (Kazanjian, p. 3). It is the ongoing insight that ethos or culture provides us with the framework for survival and etiquette. Human factors and phenomenology are two specific manifestation of that insight.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Theory

  • Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Social Dimensions of Work Englewood Cliffs, NJ.: Prentice-Hall; 1972
  • Martin Buber I and Thou New York: Charles Scribner's Sons; 1970.
  • Jeremy Campbell The Improbable Machine New York: Simon and Schuster; 1989,
  • Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion Cleveland: The World Publishing Company; 1958.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
  • Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary Evanston, IL: NorthwesternUniversity Press; 1968.
  • David Stewart and Algis Mackunas Exploring Phenomenology Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
  • G. Harry Stine The Hopeful Future New York: Macmillan;1983.
  • Alfred North Whitehead Modes of Thought New York: The Macmillan Company; 1958.

b. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

  • Jack A. Adams Human Factors Engineering. New York: Macmillan; 1989.
  • Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion. Cleveland, OH: World Publishing; 1963.
  • Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Sociology of Work. Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice Hall; 1972.
  • Alphonse Chapanis, "Human Engineering," in Operations Research and Systems Engineering ed. Charles D. Flagle, William H. Huggins, and Robert R. Roy, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press; 1960.
  • Al Gini My Job, My Self. New York: Routledge; 2001.
  • Edmund Husserl Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to PhenomenologicalPhilosophy The Netherlands: Kluwer; 1967..
  • Barry H. Kantowicz and Robert D. Sorkin. Human Factors. New York: John Wiley; 1983.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Phenomenology and Education The Netherlands: Rodopi: 1998.
    • Especially chapters one and two comparing ethics, human factors, and phenomenology.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
  • Algis Mikunas and David Stewart Exploring Phenomenology. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
  • Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary. Evanston: Northwestern University Press; 1966.
  • Alfred Schutz The Phenomenology of the Social World. Evanston: Northwestern University Press;1967.

Author Information

Michael M. Kazanjian
U. S. A.

Ge Hong (Ko Hung, 283—343 C.E.)

Ge_HongGe Hong was an eclectic philosopher who dedicated his life to searching for physical immortality, which he thought was attainable through alchemy. He lived during China's tumultuous Period of Disunity (220-589 C.E.), a time in which alien conqueror regimes ruled northern China, the cradle of Chinese civilization, while a series of weak, transplanted Chinese states occupied recently colonized southern China. These political conditions, along with the social chaos they engendered, no doubt gave rise to Ge Hong's ardent desire to establish order and permanency in both his spiritual and secular worlds. His most important contribution to Chinese philosophy was his attempt to reconcile an immortality-centered Daoism with Confucianism. Equally important, to establish political order, he also tried to reconcile Legalism with Confucianism. His penetrating insight was that the teachings of no one school could solve the problems that his world faced – only a combination of the best methods of each could do so.

Table of Contents

  1. The Life of Ge Hong
  2. Immortality
  3. Reconciliation of Daoism and Confucianism
  4. Confucianism and Legalism
  5. The Importance of Broad Knowledge
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Life of Ge Hong

In 283 C.E., Ge Hong was born into a southern magnate family whose native place was the Jurong district in Danyang prefecture, which was near Nanjing, in the southwest corner of present day Jiangsu province. Both his grandfather and father had reputations for broad learning and served as high ministers for the Wu state, which ruled over southeastern China from 220-280. Ge's father continued to hold a number of middle level positions under the Western Jin dynasty (265-317) that briefly reunited China. Upon his father's death in 296, Ge endured a period of relative poverty and lost his family's extensive library due to civil strife. To educate himself, from this time on, he started copying books and reading voraciously. He began with the Confucian classics, but soon turned his attention to the various philosophical writings. Under the tutelage of Zheng Yin, who was both a Confucian classicist and a Daoist adept, Ge began his studies of the immortality arts. Zheng Yin himself was a disciple of Ge's uncle, Ge Xuan (164-244), a Daoist adept who was reputed to have become an immortal.

Like other southern gentry, Ge Hong's early career was spent in military positions. He had an extensive knowledge of martial affairs and was trained in the use of arms. In 303, at the age of twenty, he was called upon to organize and lead a militia in his native place against a rebel army, which he handily defeated. In a rare admission of violence for a Chinese literatus, he even relates that, with bow and arrow, two men and a horse died at his hands. In 305, after being promoted to the rank of a General Who Makes the Waves Submit, Ge tried to make his way to Luoyang, the capital. Although his autobiography tells us he did so "to look for unusual books," he was probably also hoping to obtain a promotion. However, due to the Rebellion of the Eight Princes that was being fought throughout northern China, he never made it; instead, he wandered throughout southern China. To escape from the turmoil that was embroiling the rest of China, he finally accepted a position as a military councilor under his friend who was appointed to be the governor of Guangzhou (Canton), a port city in the far south.

After his patron was killed enroute to assuming the governorship, Ge refused many other military appointments and remained in Guangzhou for the next eight years, living the life of a recluse at nearby Mount Luofu. In 314, he returned to his native place of Jurong. There, he studied under another Daoist adept named Bao Qing (260-330), the former governor of Nanhai prefecture, who was so impressed that he gave Ge his eldest daughter in marriage. It was during this long period of reclusion that Ge wrote his two part magnum opus whose title bore his sobriquet: the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity and the Outer Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity. Ge used the Daoist Inner Chapters to substantiate the reality of immortality and convey the methods for realizing it, while the Confucian Outer Chapters describe the problems afflicting the secular world and his proposed solutions. In fact, until the fourteenth century, the Inner Chapters and Outer Chapters circulated independently from each other. With these two works, Ge aspired to establish his own school of philosophy. Also at this time, illustrative of his aspirations, Ge compiled hagiographical works entitled Biographies of Divine Transcedents and Biographies of Recluses.

With the establishment of the Eastern Jin dynasty in southern China in 317, the transplanted throne was eager to gain the allegiance of powerful southern gentry families; thus, men such as Ge Hong were showered with official appointments, which were usually more honorary than substantive in nature. In recognition of his past military successes, Ge himself was given the title of Marquis of the Region Within the Pass. Finally, in 326, Wang Dao (276-339), the prime minister, appointed him to a series of positions, ending with that of military advisor. By 332, due to his advanced age (he was 50) and desire to find ingredients for immortality elixirs, he begged to be given a post in northern part of present-day Vietnam. On his way there, the governor of Guangzhou, Deng Yue, detained him there indefinitely. He thus took up residence at nearby Mount Luofu where he engaged in immortality practices until his death in 343.

By his own admission, Ge Hong was a man that was out of sorts with his age. He was a southerner in an age where only northern émigrés were given posts of substance. Due to his lack of verbal eloquence, he could never obtain social prestige in the salons where men were prized for their ability to engage in "Pure Talk" - abstract philosophical discussions. Nor did his strong Confucian sense of morality sit well with the libertine tendencies of that prevailed among the northern émigrés. The outlet of his frustrations became his writings, in which he attacked the fashions and trends of his day and proposed his own vision of how people should obtain stability in an instable world.

2. Immortality

Ge Hong wholeheartedly believed that anyone, through unrelenting effort and study, could obtain immortality. One does not have to be either rich or powerful to do so; in fact, wealth and position are harmful because they inhibit one from attaining the necessary moral and physical serenity. Moreover, it is not up to the arbitrary decisions of deities to extend our lives - they are merely divine administrators who keep track of our sins and good deeds; consequently, sacrifices and prayers to them for this purpose are useless. Thus, whether one can obtain immortality is entirely based on his or her own diligence and determination. It was precisely for those educated people who wanted and were willing to work towards obtaining immortality that Ge wrote his Inner Chapters. The overriding importance that he attached to obtaining eternal life is evident in that the inner, and thereby his most important, chapters of his magnum opus were dedicated to the topic.

Ge Hong firmly believed that physical immortality was possible. This is because all things are permeated by the metaphysical oneness, xuan (the mystery), which creates and animates all things. Significantly, for Ge, xuan is synonymous with the words dao (the way, the ultimate reality) and yi (the one, the unity). In this light, he describes xuan in the following manner: it "carries within it the embryo of the Original One, it forms and shapes the two Principles (Yin and Yang); it exhales and absorbs the great Genesis, it inspires and transforms the multitude of species, it makes constellations go round, it shaped the primordial Darkness, it guides the wonderful mainspring of the universe, it exhales the four seasons … if one adds to it, it does not increase. If one takes away from it, it does not grow less. If something is given to it, it is not increased in glory. If something is taken from it, it does not suffer. Where the Mystery is present, joy is infinite; where the Mystery has departed, efficacy is exhausted and the spirit disappears" (Robinet, 82-83). In other words, the key to immortality is maintaining this everlasting oneness within oneself - if one cannot do so, he or she will soon die. The reason why people lose it is that they become attached through their desires to the outside world, thereby forgetting the jewel that resides within. As Ge put it, "The way of xuan is obtained within oneself, but is lost due to things outside oneself. Those who employ xuan are gods; those who forget it are merely [empty] vessels."

How does one maintain the unity within oneself? For Ge Hong it had much to do with preserving, enhancing, and refining one's qi, which for him embodied the metaphysical mystery. Qi, which originally meant "breath" or "vapor," came to designate the vital energy that exists within and animates all things. As Ge Hong relates, "people reside within qi and qi resides within people. From heaven and earth down to the ten thousand things, each one requires qi to live. As for those who excel at circulating their qi, internally they are able to nourish their body; externally, they are able to repel illnesses." Since each person receives a finite amount of qi at birth, he recommends various methods to retain and enhance it, which include breathing exercises, sexual techniques, calisthenics, dietary restrictions, and the ingestion of herbal medicines. Since none of these methods is infallible, he recommends that an adept should practice a number of them in combination with each other. By doing so, one protects oneself from manifold disasters, such as illnesses, demons, savage beasts and weapons, while also lessening desires, transforming the body, and extending one's lifespan. These methods could even give their practitioners supernatural powers, such as curing illnesses, raising the dead, seeing the future, commanding gods and ghosts, forgoing food for years, and the ability to disappear.

Nevertheless, none of these techniques could permanently keep xuan within oneself. To do that, nothing was comparable with taking alchemically created medicines. Ge thus informs us that, "Even if one performs breathing exercises and calisthenics, as well as ingests herbal medicines, this can only extend the years of your lifespan, but it will not save you from death. Ingesting divine cinnabar will make your lifespan inexhaustible. You will last as long as heaven and earth, be able to travel on clouds and ride dragons, and ascend at will to the Heaven of Highest Clarity." Alchemically derived medicines, the best of which contained either liquefied gold or reverted cinnabar, were able to have this marvelous effect because the substances from which they were made had shown themselves, through repeated firings in the alchemist's stove, to be impervious to decay or dissolution. According to Ge, "As for forging of gold and cinnabar, the longer one burns them, the more marvelous their transformations. When gold enters the flames, even after one hundred firings, it will not disappear. If you bury it forever, it will never decay. If one ingests these two substances, they will refine that person's body, and make it so that he or she will neither age nor die." In other words, one makes one's own body imperishable by ingesting imperishable things. Mechanically what happens is that, upon ingestion, these substances seep into one's blood and qi, thereby making them stronger. Ge Hong calls this using an outside substance to fortify one's self. The reason why herbs are inferior to gold and cinnabar is that they are perishable; thus, they lack the capacity to make the body imperishable. Unfortunately though, the ingredients for making these mineral medicines are difficult to obtain, the process of smelting them is arduous, and the ritual circumstances under which they must be made are elaborate; as a result, Ge Hong several times admits that he has never had enough resources to attempt to produce these superb formulas.

3.Reconciliation of Daoism and Confucianism

It is often said of premodern Chinese literati that they were Daoist at home while Confucian in the office. Ge Hong was in fact probably one of the first Chinese thinkers to consciously try to reconcile Confucianism and Daoism. As the division of his major work into inner and outer chapters indicates, he did so by asserting that Confucianism and Daoism addressed different aspects of life. Confucianism addressed the external world and provided means by which to ameliorate its many problems; Daoism concerned the inner world and provided means by which to attain immortality. As Ge succinctly put it, "For an extraordinarily talented person, what difficulty could there be in practicing both (Confucianism and Daoism) at the same time? Inwardly, such people treasure the way of nourishing life; outwardly, they exhibit their brilliance in the world. If they regulate their persons, their persons then will be cultivated for a prolonged time; if they rule the country, the country will achieve the state of great peace." Cultivating one's spirit for immortality thereby automatically enables one to rule a country well. Thus, if one becomes a terrestrial immortal, Ge Hong sees no reason why such a person cannot hold office and contribute to the welfare of his generation.

Nevertheless, even though both were important, Daoism was even more so. That is because in the far past the sage kings followed the Dao "the oneness" or "the natural order of things," as a result, the people's conduct was flawless and natural processes transpired smoothly without disruption or disaster. Later kings, however, no longer followed the Dao; consequently, natural disasters occurred frequently and people became evil and unruly. It was only at this point that Confucianism was introduced in an attempt to rectify this situation. Thus, Daoism is superior because it kept the world from becoming chaotic; Confucianim, on the other hand, only appeared when the world declined into disorder and its practitioners have often become entangled in the resulting mess. Thus, Daoists, like Confucians, provide the world with moral order, but they do so without becoming soiled in the process. As Ge Hong put it, "In regard to the Daoists, their making consists of excelling in cultivating the self to complete their duties; their repose consists in excelling in doing away with the impurities of people; their governance consists of excelling in cutting off misfortune before it occurs; their giving consists in excelling at saving things, but not considering it virtuous; their activity consist in excelling at using their heart-mind to urge the people [to do good]; their quiescence consists in excelling at being cautious and without rancor. These characteristics are why Daoism is the ruler and leader of the hundred schools of philosophy and why it is the ancestor of [Confucian] righteous and benevolence." Nevertheless, since only a few people are able to correctly pursue Daoism and present times are disordered, Confucianism is necessary to maintain the social order that is embodied in the family and the state. Very much in a Confucian vein, he evaluates both philosophies through a moral lenses.

One of the ways in which Ge Hong connected Confucianism and Daoism is by stating that one needed to perfect oneself ethically to pursue immortality. In his Inner Chapters, Ge Hong makes it clear that none of the methods for prolonging one's life will work unless one is morally pure, which can only happen by realizing Confucian virtues. Ge explicitly states that, "those who seek to become immortals must regard loyalty, filiality, peacefulness, obedience, benevolence and trustworthiness as fundamental. If one does not cultivate his or her moral behavior, and merely instead devotes oneself to esoteric methods, he or she will never obtain an extended lifespan." Since these virtues, particularly that of benevolence (ren), emphasize putting the interests of others before one's own, they cultivated a sense of selflessness and detachment that Ge viewed as essential for maintaining the mysterious oneness within oneself.

His strong emphasis on morality led him to systematize and quantify earlier ideas about how spirits punished immoral behavior. Ge Hong maintained that for each minor moral transgression one committed, the Director of Fates would subtract three days from his or her lifespan; for each major transgression, three hundred days would be deducted. To guide people's behavior, he even listed sixty-four possible sins. Very few of these prohibitions are religious in nature - the overwhelming majority concern secular life and many are Confucian inspired. Furthermore, he posited that, to achieve spiritual benefits, one had to continuously accumulate good deeds: 300 were needed to become an earthbound immortal and 1200 to become a celestial immortal. One mishap and the balance would be canceled. Ge Hong even transformed the three corpses, evil entities within the body who endeavor to destroy it to earn their freedom, into ethical agents that try to decimate their host's health by disclosing his sins to the celestial authorities. This system of measuring good and bad deeds would later giver rise to the Ledgers of Merit and Demerit, popular books that let people keep track of their moral progress by assigning numerical scores to virtuous and immoral behavior.

Ge Hong also attempted to reconcile Daoism with Confucianism by both emphasizing the importance and naturalness of hierarchy and attacking Daoism's equalitarian tendencies. Although Laozi and Zhuangzi always assumed that kings would exist, their utopian vision of society was a small village society whose inhabitants never leave their hamlets, do not use contrivances, and have few material goods. In order to attack this line of thinking in his Outer Chapters, Ge Hong puts forth the views of a man named Bao Jingyan who extended the Daoist arguments to their logical conclusion. Bao maintains that the simple agrarian utopias in which people lived simply and equally were lost due to the creation of hierarchy, which was based on the strong oppressing the weak and the smart deceiving the foolish. With the lord/subject tie came a host of evils such as weapons, armies, rebellions, greed, thievery, deceit, extravagance, and crime. Thus, Bao advocated the abolishment of rulers as the key to securing peace and happiness. Incidentally, Bao is the earliest known Chinese advocate of anarchy. Ge Hong, on the contrary, thinks that in a state of nature people think only of their own desires, hence they vie with each other like beasts for scarce resources. Hierarchy was thus established to put an end to the strong oppressing the weak. Moreover, hierarchy is natural: as the oneness unfolds into the ten thousand things, it divides itself into high and low; hence, heaven is above and earth is below. Thus, it is only natural that some people are more important than others. This is true to the extent that even immortals are hierarchically organized: freshly minted immortals must occupy the lower rungs of the celestial bureaucracy and serve their superiors, while terrestrial immortals are inferior to their celestial counterparts. Ge also recognized that civilization could not be undone and that hierarchy had brought about material progress, as the following passage indicates: "Now, [would you be at ease] if I made you reside in the cramped quarters of a nest or cave? [Would you be at ease] if upon your death, your body was abandoned in the fields? [Would you be at ease] if upon being impeded by a river, you had to swim to cross it? [Would you be at ease] if upon traveling through the mountains, you had to walk and shoulder luggage? [Would you be at ease] if your cooking implements were cast away and you had to make do with raw and smelly food? [Would you be at ease] if you no longer had stone needles for acupuncture and had to merely rely on nature to [cure] your illness? [Would you be at ease] if nakedness was your only ornament and you had no clothes? [Would you be at ease] if you came across a female and made her your mate without an intermediary? You and I would both likely say, 'to do these things would be impossible.' How much less could we do without a lord!" In other words, progress and hierarchy are realities, and beneficial ones at that, which can neither be ignored nor abandoned.

4. Confucianism and Legalism

Since Ge Hong recognized that this world cannot be ignored, he believed that one must find a way to improve it. Given the corruption and chaos that ruled his age, like many of his contemporaries, he looked for answers beyond Confucianism to its arch nemesis, Legalism. His reform program was thus a synthesis of both Confucian and Legalist political ideas. First of all, even though he believed that the ruler, like a good Confucian sovereign, should cultivate his person, lead the people through his own moral example, and take their welfare as his overriding concern, he admitted that this was not sufficient to guide society. To govern well, one had to have clear laws to punish miscreants. He warns us that, "It is not that governing with benevolence is not wonderful, it is just that the black-haired masses can be crafty and deceitful. They hanker after profit and forget righteousness. If one does not order them with one's authority and correct them with punishments, if one only admires the ways of Fuxi and Shennong (Confucian cultural heroes), then chaos cannot be avoided and the resulting calamities will be numerous. [Yet] to use killing to stop killing, how could anyone find joy in that?" In short, although leading through one's moral example is preferable, it is not realistic: it is sometimes necessary to use the harsher methods. Since Confucian moral example was not enough, the ruler must turn to the law and mete out punishments. Following Legalist ideas, Ge argues that the laws must be clear, explicit, and fair; i.e., they must be applicable to everyone. Moreover, the punishments for misbehavior must be severe. It is precisely generous rewards and harsh punishments that will keep the strong from oppressing the weak. Regimes are weak because their laws are neither severe nor enforced. In line with this thinking, Ge was in favor of reviving punishments that mutilated the guilty. Convicts suffering from such punishments would be constant reminders to the people of the terrible price to be paid for violating the law. Lest the modern reader judge Ge harshly for supporting such draconian measures, since the death penalty largely replaced the mutilation punishments, Ge thought the latter was more humane, since at least the criminal would escape with his or her life.

Another way in which Ge Hong tried to reconcile Confucianism and Legalism was through the type of training officials should receive. Under the Legalist Qin dynasty (221-207 BCE), which unified China for the first time, officials were largely men who excelled in legal and administrative matters. During the Han dynasty (206 BCE - 220 CE), particularly during its latter half, Confucianism gradually became the dominant ideology, hence the education and knowledge of officials became more centered on the Confucian classics. Men who primarily specialized in legal matters were slighted and only given clerical positions. Due to this situation, Ge complained that officials, no matter what their level, no longer understood the laws, hence they often issued incorrect judgments and were deceived by their more legally savvy underlings. Consequently, he thought that aspirants to officialdom should be tested not only on the Confucian classics, but also on the law.

5. The Importance of Broad Knowledge

That officials should be knowledgeable in both the classics and the law highlights one of his most consistent teachings: a person must be broadly educated and that deep study leads to the mastery of all things. For Ge Hong, through the diligent acquisition of knowledge, anything was possible, whether it be ruling a country or attaining immortality. In this vein, he said, "When one peels away dark clouds, one exposes the sun; as a result, the ten thousand things cannot hide their shapes. By unrolling bamboo and silk (that is, by reading books) and investigating the past and present, heaven and earth thereby hide none of their facts. How much less so gods and demons? And how much less so the affairs of people?" Nevertheless, one could not just specialize in one kind of learning, but had to learn the teachings of many different schools. Likewise, in seeking immortality, one should study many techniques and never merely practice one exclusively. Similarly, in terms of book learning, one should not merely confine oneself to learning the classics because all written works had something of worth. Indeed, he propounded the revolutionary sentiment that the elaborate writings of his day were superior to the simplistic classics. The more widely one read, and the more techniques one acquired, the more one would be likely to excel in both the spiritual and secular worlds. Study was also a means of self-cultivation - through it one could eliminate desires by becoming indifferent to his or her physical circumstances.

According to Ge Hong, one of the primary reasons governance of his time was so inept and ineffective was that officials were not selected on the basis of their intelligence, but only due to their connections, bribery, or their ability to speak eloquently. Ge thought the solution to this problem would be to use examinations to select men on the basis of their knowledge of the classics and administrative matters. The examinations should be held in the palace, supervised by high officials, and their contents should be kept in the utmost secrecy. By this means, there would be little opportunity to pass the examinations through deceit or bribery. Moreover, when the only way to become an official is through examinations, everyone will value study. Although he admitted that passing the examinations would not guarantee that that person would be a good official, he thought that the ability to do so was a fair indicator of talent. In other words, Ge Hong was one of the earliest proponents of selecting officials through a vigorous and fair examination system, one of the hallmarks of Chinese civilization.

6. Conclusion

In sum, Ge Hong was a philosopher who, due to the topsy-turvy world in which he lived, was willing to look for solutions in the wisdom of any philosopher, regardless of his sectarian background. With Ge's overriding sense of the importance of morality and his overwhelming urge for permanency in the form of immortality, he reconciled Confucian and Daoism by saying that both were trying to improve the condition of mankind and that practicing Confucian virtues was necessary for attaining immortality. Likewise, this search for concrete, no-nonsense answers also led him to reconcile his Confucian leanings with the real politick teachings of Legalism. Thus, although he maintained that the ruler must endeavor to mold his people's behavior through his own example, generous rewards and severe punishments were even more important in regulating the affairs of the troublesome masses. In order to manifest both these philosophies, Ge advocated that officials be both experts in the classics and legal matters. Thus, Ge helped fashion the values that allowed latter Chinese to unproblematically simultaneously use Daoist, Confucian, and Legalist assumptions in both their public and private lives.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Balazs, Etienne. Chinese Civilization and Bureaucracy. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1964.
    • Besides giving a valuable introduction to the tumultuous intellectual and social milieu in which Ge Hong lived, this work also translates part of the chapter from his Outer Chapters in which Ge Hong critiques the anarchist Bao Jingyan.
  • Campany, Robert Ford. To Live as Long as Heaven and Earth: A Translation and Study of Ge Hong's Traditions of Divine Transcendents. Berkeley: University of California Press, 2002.
    • This fine translation of Ge Hong's biographies of immortals has an introduction that insightfully describes his religious ideas.
  • Lai Chi-Tim, "Ko Hung's Discourse of Hsien-Immortality: A Daoist Configuration of an Alternate Ideal Self-Identity," Numen 45 (1998): 183-220.
    • Although somewhat turgid, this article successfully delineates the novel aspects of Ge Hong's views on immortality and situates his religious beliefs within the social and political context in which they were formed.
  • Robinet, Isabelle. Daoism: Growth of a Religion, translated by Phyllis Brooks. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • Robinet devotes an entire chapter of this work to Ge Hong and masterfully contextualizes his thought within the Daoist religious tradition.
  • Sailey, Jay. The Master Who Embraces Simplicity: A Study of the Philosopher Ko Hung, A.D. 283-343. San Francisco: Chinese Materials Center, Inc., 1978.
    • The author translates twenty-one chapters of Ge Hong's Outer Chapters. He also deftly summarizes Ge Hong's ideas as seen in this work.
  • Sivin, Nathan. "On the Pao P'u Tzu Nei Pien and the Life of Ko Hong (283-343)," Isis 60 (1976): 388-391.
    • In this short article, Sivin makes some important points about the circulation of his works and the length of his life.
  • Sivin, Nathan. "On the Word 'Daoist' as a Source of Perplexity." History of Religions 17 (1978): 303-330.
    • This intellectually penetrating article challenges the idea that Ge Hong was a Daoist at all, in the sense that he was not at all connected with organized Daoist religion.
  • Ware, James R. Alchemy, Medicine & Religion in the China of A.D. 320: The Nei P'ien of Ko Hung. Rpt; New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1981.
    • Originally published in 1966, this work is a complete translation of Ge Hong's The Inner Chapters. The reader must beware, though, since the text is inaccurately translated through Judeo-Christian lenses.
  • Yu, David C. History of Chinese Daoism: Volume 1. Lanham: University Press of America, 2000.
    • This overview of the history of Daoism devotes a lengthy chapter to Ge Hong with extensive quotations to his views on immortality.

Author Information

Keith Knapp
The Citadel
U. S. A.

Michel Foucault: Feminism

Poststructuralism and contemporary feminism have emerged as two of the most influential political and cultural movements of the late twentieth century. The recent alliance between them has been marked by an especially lively engagement with the work of French philosopher Michel Foucault. Although Foucault makes few references to women or to the issue of gender in his writings, his treatment of the relations between power, the body and sexuality has stimulated extensive feminist interest. Foucault’s idea that the body and sexuality are cultural constructs rather than natural phenomena has made a significant contribution to the feminist critique of essentialism. While feminists have found Foucault’s analysis of the relations between power and the body illuminating, they have also drawn attention to its limitations. From the perspective of a feminist politics that aims to promote women’s autonomy, the tendency of a Foucauldian account of power to reduce social agents to docile bodies seems problematic. Although many feminist theorists remain critical of Foucault’s questioning of the categories of the subject and agency on the grounds that such questioning undermines the emancipatory aims of feminism, others have argued that in his late work he develops a more robust account of subjectivity and resistance which, while not without its problems from a feminist perspective, nevertheless has a lot to offer a feminist politics. The affinities and tensions between Foucault’s thought and contemporary feminism are discussed below.

Table of Contents

  1. Background: Foucault's Genealogy of Power, Knowledge and the Subject
  2. Between Foucault and Feminism: Convergence and Critique
  3. Power, the Body and Sexuality
  4. Subjectivity, Identity and Resistance
  5. Freedom, Power and Politics
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Background: Foucault's Genealogy of Power, Knowledge and the Subject

In the works of his middle years - Discipline and Punish and The History of Sexuality, Vol. 1 - Foucault traces the emergence of some of the practices, concepts, forms of knowledge, social institutions and techniques of government which have contributed to shaping modern European culture. He calls the method of historical analysis he employs 'genealogical'. Genealogy is a form of critical history in the sense that it attempts a diagnosis of 'the present time, and of what we are, in this very moment' in order 'to question … what is postulated as self-evident … to dissipate what is familiar and accepted' (Foucault 1988a: 265). What distinguishes genealogical analysis from traditional historiography is that it is 'a form of history which can account for the constitution of knowledges, discourses, domains of objects etc. without having to make reference to a subject which is either transcendental in relation to the field of events or runs in its empty sameness throughout history' (Foucault 1980: 149). Rather than assuming that the movement of history can be explained by the intentions and aims of individual actors, genealogy investigates the complex and shifting network of relations between power, knowledge and the body which produce historically specific forms of subjectivity. Foucault links his genealogical studies to a modality of social critique which he describes as a 'critical ontology of the present'. In a late paper, he explains that an ontology of the present involves 'an analysis of the historical limits that are imposed on us' in order to create the space for 'an experiment with the possibility of going beyond them’ (Foucault 1984: 50). Thus, genealogy is a form of social critique that seeks to determine possibilities for social change and ethical transformation of ourselves.

One of the central threads of Foucault's genealogy of the present is an analysis of the transformations in the nature and functioning of power which mark the transition to modern society. Foucault's genealogy of modern power challenges the commonly held assumption that power is an essentially negative, repressive force that operates purely through the mechanisms of law, taboo and censorship. According to Foucault, this 'juridico-discursive' conception of power (Foucault 1978: 82) has its origins in the practices of power characteristic of pre-modern societies. In such societies, he claims, power was centralized and coordinated by a sovereign authority who exercised absolute control over the population through the threat or open display of violence. From the seventeenth century onwards, however, as the growth and care of populations increasingly became the primary concerns of the state, new mechanisms of power emerged which centered around the administration and management of 'life'. In the complex story that Foucault tells, this new form of 'bio-power' coalesced around two poles. One pole is concerned with the efficient government of the population as a whole and focuses on the management of the life processes of the social body. It involves the regulation of phenomena such as birth, death, sickness, disease, health, sexual relations and so on. The other pole, which Foucault labels 'disciplinary power', targets the human body as an object to be manipulated and trained. In Discipline and Punish Foucault studies the practices of discipline and training associated with disciplinary power. He suggests that these practices were first cultivated in isolated institutional settings such as prisons, military establishments, hospitals, factories and schools but were gradually applied more broadly as techniques of social regulation and control. The key feature of disciplinary power is that it is exercised directly on the body. Disciplinary practices subject bodily activities to a process of constant surveillance and examination that enables a continuous and pervasive control of individual conduct. The aim of these practices is to simultaneously optimize the body's capacities, skills and productivity and to foster its usefulness and docility: 'What was then being formed was a policy of coercions that act on the body, a calculated manipulation of its elements, its gestures, its behavior. The human body was entering a machinery of power that explores it, breaks it down and rearranges it…Thus, discipline produces subjected and practiced bodies, "docile" bodies' (Foucault 1977: 138-9). It is not, however, only the body that disciplinary techniques target. Foucault presents disciplinary power as productive of certain types of subject as well. In Discipline and Punish he describes the way in which the central technique of disciplinary power - constant surveillance - which is initially directed toward disciplining the body, takes hold of the mind as well to induce a psychological state of 'conscious and permanent visibility' (Foucault 1977: 201). In other words, perpetual surveillance is internalized by individuals to produce the kind of self-awareness that defines the modern subject. With the idea that modern power operates to produce the phenomena it targets Foucault challenges the juridical notion of power as law which assumes that power is simply the constraint or repression of something that is already constituted. On Foucault's account the transition to modernity entails the replacement of the law by the norm as the primary instrument of social control. Foucault links the importance assumed by norms in modern society to the development of the human or social sciences. In the first volume of The History of Sexuality he describes how, in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, sex and sexuality became crucial political issues in a society concerned with managing and directing the life of individuals and of populations. On Foucault's account, the spread of bio-power is intimately connected to the social science discourses on sex and sexuality which proliferated during this period. These discourses, he claims, tended to understand sex as an instinctual biological and psychic drive with deep links to identity and, thus, with potentially far-reaching effects on the sexual and social behavior of individuals. The idea that the sexual drive could function in a normal, healthy manner or could be warped and perverted into pathological forms led to a project of classification of behavior along a scale of normalization and pathologization of the sexual instinct (Dreyfus & Rabinow 1982: 173). Once the social (and sexual) science categories of normalcy and deviancy were established, various political technologies aimed at treating and reforming 'deviant' behavior could be sanctioned as in the interests of both the individual and society. Thus, Foucault suggests that in modern society the behavior of individuals and groups is increasingly pervasively controlled through standards of normality which are disseminated by a range of assessing, diagnostic, prognostic and normative knowledges such as criminology, medicine, psychology and psychiatry. Modern individuals, moreover, become the agents of their own 'normalization' to the extent that they are subjected to, and become invested in, the categories, classifications and norms propagated by scientific and administrative discourses which purport to reveal the 'truth' of their identities. Modern disciplinary society can, therefore, dispense with direct forms of repression and constraint because social control is achieved by means of subtler strategies of normalization, strategies which produce self-regulating, 'normalized' individuals. It is Foucault's insight into the productivity of the practices and technologies characteristic of normalizing bio-power that underpins his general conclusion that power in modern societies is a fundamentally creative rather than repressive force (Foucault 1977: 194). Above all, Foucault claims that modern regimes of power operate to produce us as subjects who are both the objects and vehicles of power. He explains that: 'The individual is not to be conceived as a sort of elementary nucleus, a primitive atom, a multiple and inert material on which power comes to fasten or against which it happens to strike, and in so doing subdues or crushes individuals. In fact, it is already one of the prime effects of power that certain bodies, certain gestures, certain discourses, certain desires, come to be identified and constituted as individuals. The individual, that is, is not the vis-à-vis of power; it is … one of its prime effects.' (Foucault 1980: 98). Foucault's analysis of productive bio-power points to a complex interaction between modern forms of power and knowledge: 'the exercise of power perpetually creates knowledge and, conversely, knowledge constantly induces effects of power' (Foucault 1980: 52). For Foucault, power can be said to create knowledge in two related senses. Firstly, in the sense that particular institutions of power make certain forms of knowledge historically possible. In the case of the social sciences, for example, it is the refinement of disciplinary techniques for observing and analyzing the body in various institutional settings that facilitates the expansion of new areas of social research. Power can also be said to create knowledge in the sense that institutions of power determine the conditions under which scientific statements come to be counted as true or false (Hacking 1986). According to Foucault, then, 'truth is a thing of this world: it is produced only by virtue of multiple forms of constraint. And it induces regular effects of power' (Foucault 1980: 131). This description suggests that the production of 'truth' is never entirely separable from technologies of power. On the other hand, Foucault maintains that knowledge induces effects of power in so far as it constitutes new objects of inquiry - 'objects' like 'the delinquent', ‘the homosexual’ or ‘the criminal type’ - which then become available for manipulation and control (Rouse 1994: 97). For example, he claims that it is the knowledge generated by the human sciences which enables modern power to circulate through finer channels, 'gaining access to individuals themselves, to their bodies, their gestures, and all their daily actions' (Foucault 1980: 151). It is in order to signal the mutually conditioning operations of power and knowledge that Foucault speaks of regimes of 'power/knowledge' or ‘discourses’; that is, structured ways of knowing and exercising power.

2. Between Foucault and Feminism: Convergence and Critique

From the perspective of contemporary social and political theory, the originality of Foucault's genealogies of power/knowledge resides in the challenge they pose to traditional ways of thinking about power. It is this challenge that has made Foucault's work both a significant resource for feminist theory and generated heated debate amongst feminist social and political theorists. While there is broad agreement that Foucault's redefinition of how we think about power in contemporary societies contains important insights for feminism, feminists remain divided over the implications of this redefinition for feminist theory and practice.

An analysis of power relations is central to the feminist project of understanding the nature and causes of women's subordination. Drawing on the traditional model of power as repression, many types of feminist theory have assumed that the oppression of women can be explained by patriarchal social structures which secure the power of men over women. Increasingly, however, this assumption is being called into question by other feminists who are concerned to counter what they regard as the oversimplified conception of power relations this view entails, as well as its problematic implication that women are simply the passive, powerless victims of male power. In the context of this debate, Foucault's work on power has been used by some feminists to develop a more complex analysis of the relations between gender and power which avoids the assumption that the oppression of women is caused in any simple way by men's possession of power. On the basis of Foucault's understanding of power as exercised rather than possessed, as circulating throughout the social body rather than emanating from the top down, and as productive rather than repressive (Sawicki 1988: 164), feminists have sought to challenge accounts of gender relations which emphasize domination and victimization so as to move towards a more textured understanding of the role of power in women's lives. Foucault’s redefinition of power has made a significant and varied contribution to this project. Foucault's notion that power is constitutive of that upon which it acts has enabled feminists to explore the often complicated ways in which women's experiences, self-understandings, comportment and capacities are constructed in and by the power relations which they are seeking to transform. The idea that modern power is involved in producing rather than simply repressing individuals has also played a part in a controversial move within feminism away from traditional liberationist political orientations. Eschewing a liberationist political program which aims for total emancipation from power, Foucauldian-influenced feminism concentrates on exposing the localized forms that gender power relations take at the micro-political level in order to determine concrete possibilities for resistance and social change. In pursuing this project, feminist scholars have drawn on Foucault's analysis of the productive dimension of disciplinary power which is exercised outside of the narrowly defined political realm in order to examine the workings of power in women's everyday lives. Some feminists have also found Foucault’s contention that the body is the principal site of power in modern society useful in their explorations of the social control of women through their bodies and sexuality. Finally, feminists have taken up Foucault's analytic of power/knowledge, with its emphasis on the criteria by which claims to knowledge are legitimated, in order to develop a theory which avoids generalizing from the experiences of Western, white, heterosexual, middle-class feminisms. Drawing on Foucault's questioning of fixed essences and his relativist notion of truth, feminists have sought to create a theoretical space for the articulation of hitherto marginalized subject positions, political perspectives and interests. While there is considerable overlap between Foucault's analytic of power/knowledge and feminist concerns, his work has also been subject to strong criticism by feminists. This more critical body of work takes issue with precisely those aspects of Foucault's conception of power that Foucauldian feminists have found useful. The most commonly cited feminist objections center around two issues: his view of subjectivity as constructed by power and his failure to outline the norms which inform his critical enterprise. Nancy Fraser argues that the problem with Foucault's claim that forms of subjectivity are constituted by relations of power is that it leaves no room for resistance to power. If individuals are simply the effects of power, mere 'docile bodies' shaped by power, then it becomes difficult to explain who resists power. Thus, Fraser finds Foucault's assertion that power always generates resistance incoherent. She argues, moreover, that Foucault's refusal to articulate independently justified norms which would enable him to distinguish acceptable from unacceptable forms of power means that he cannot answer crucial questions about why domination ought to be resisted. According to Fraser, 'only with the introduction of normative notions could he begin to tell us what is wrong with the modern power/knowledge regime and why we ought to oppose it' (Fraser 1989: 29). In Fraser’s view, Foucault’s normatively neutral stance on power limits the value of his work for feminism because it fails to provide the normative resources required to criticize structures of domination and to guide programs for social change. Echoing and extending Fraser's criticisms, Nancy Hartsock contends that Foucault’s questioning of the categories of subjectivity and agency should be treated with suspicion by feminists. She asks: 'Why is it that just at the moment when so many of us who have been silenced begin to demand the right to name ourselves, to act as subjects rather than objects of history, that just then the concept of subjecthood becomes problematic?' (Hartsock 1990: 164). Like Fraser, Hartsock finds Foucault’s conception of modern power problematic in so far as it reduces individuals to 'docile bodies' rather than subjects with the capacity to resist power. She claims that Foucault's understanding of the subject as an effect of power threatens the viability of a feminist politics because it denies the liberatory subject and, thus, condemns women to perpetual oppression. Hartsock argues, moreover, that Foucault's rejection of the Enlightenment belief that truth is intrinsically opposed to power (and, therefore, inevitably plays a liberating role) undermines the emancipatory political aims of feminism. By insisting on the mutually conditioning operations of knowledge and power, Hartsock contends that Foucault denies the possibility of liberatory knowledge; that is, he denies the possibility that increased and better knowledge of patriarchal power can lead to liberation from oppression. For this reason she believes that his work is incompatible with the fundamentally emancipatory political orientation of feminism. These criticisms of Foucault are directed at the conception of the subject and power developed in his middle years. Some feminists have argued, however, that in his late work Foucault modifies his theoretical perspective in ways that make it more useful to the project of articulating a coherent feminist ethics and politics. Feminist responses to Foucault's late work are discussed in the final section.

3. Power, the Body and Sexuality

There are a number of aspects of Foucault's analysis of the relations between power, the body and sexuality that have stimulated feminist interest. Firstly, Foucault's analyses of the productive dimensions of disciplinary powers which is exercised outside the narrowly defined political domain overlap with the feminist project of exploring the micropolitics of personal life and exposing the mechanics of patriarchal power at the most intimate levels of women's experience. Secondly, Foucault’s treatment of power and its relation to the body and sexuality has provided feminist social and political theorists with some useful conceptual tools for the analysis of the social construction of gender and sexuality and contributed to the critique of essentialism within feminism. Finally, Foucault's identification of the body as the principal target of power has been used by feminists to analyze contemporary forms of social control over women's bodies and minds.

Rather than focusing on the centralized sources of societal power in agencies such as the economy or the state, Foucault's analysis of power emphasizes micro level power relations. Foucault argues that, since modern power operates in a capillary fashion throughout the social body, it is best grasped in its concrete and local effects and in the everyday practices which sustain and reproduce power relations. This emphasis on the everyday practices through which power relations are reproduced has converged with the feminist project of analyzing the politics of personal relations and altering gendered power relations at the most intimate levels of experience 'in the institutions of marriage, motherhood and compulsory heterosexuality, in the ‘private' relations between the sexes and in the everyday rituals and regimens that govern women's relationships to themselves and their bodies (Sawicki 1998: 93). Nancy Fraser notes that Foucault's work gives renewed impetus to what is often referred to as 'the politics of everyday life’ in so far as it provides 'the empirical and conceptual basis for treating phenomena such as sexuality, the school, psychiatry, medicine and social science as political phenomena.' She argues that because Foucault’s approach to the analysis of power sanctions the treatment of problems in these areas as political problems it 'widens the arena within which people may collectively confront, understand and try to change the character of their lives' (Fraser 1989: 26). One of Foucault's most fertile insight into the workings of power at the micro-political level is his identification of the body and sexuality as the direct locus of social control. Foucault insists on the historical specificity of the body. It is this emphasis on the body as directly targeted and formed by historically variable regimes of bio-power that has made Foucault's version of poststructuralist theory the most attractive to feminist social and political theorists. The problem of how to conceive of the body without reducing its materiality to a fixed biological essence has been one of the key issues for feminist theory. At a fundamental level, a notion of the body is central to the feminist analysis of the oppression of women because biological differences between the sexes are the foundation that has served to ground and legitimize gender inequality. By means of an appeal to ahistorical biological characteristics, the idea that women are inferior to men is naturalized and legitimized. This involves two related conceptual moves. Firstly, women's bodies are judged inferior with reference to norms and ideals based on men's physical capacities and, secondly, biological functions are collapsed into social characteristics. While traditionally men have been thought to be capable of transcending the level of the biological through the use of their rational faculties, women have tended to be defined entirely it terms of their physical capacities for reproduction and motherhood. In an effort to avoid this conflation of the social category of woman with biological functions (essentialism), earlier forms of feminism developed a theory of social construction based on the distinction between sex and gender. The sex/gender distinction represents an attempt by feminists to sever the connection between the biological category of sex and the social category of gender. According to this view of social construction, gender is the cultural meaning that comes to be contingently attached to the sexed body. Once gender is understood as culturally constructed it is possible to avoid the essentialist idea that gender derives from the natural body in any one way. However, while the distinction between ahistorical biological sexes and culturally constructed gender roles challenges the notion that a woman's biological makeup is her social destiny, it entails a problematic dissociation of culturally constructed genders from sexed bodies. The effect of this dissociation is that the sexed body comes to be seen as irrelevant to an individual's gendered cultural identity. It is this disconcerting consequence of drawing a distinction between sex and gender that has led some feminists to appropriate Foucault's theory of the body and sexuality. In the first volume of The History of Sexuality, Foucault develops an anti-essentialist account of the sexual body, which, however, doesn't deny its materiality. At the heart of Foucault’s history of sexuality is an analysis of the production of the category of sex and its function in regimes of power aimed at controlling the sexual body. Foucault argues that the construct of a supposedly 'natural' sex functions to disguise the productive operation of power in relation to sexuality: 'The notion of sex brought about a fundamental reversal; it made it possible to invert the representation of the relationships of power to sexuality, causing the latter to appear, not in its essential and positive relation to power, but as being rooted in a specific and irreducible urgency which power tries as best it can to dominate' (Foucault 1978: 155). Foucault's claim here is that the relationship between power and sexuality is misrepresented when sexuality is viewed as an unruly natural force that power simply opposes, represses or constrains. Rather, the phenomenon of sexuality should be understood as constructed through the exercise of power relations. Drawing on Foucault's account of the historical construction of sexuality and the part played by the category of sex in this construction, feminists have been able to rethink gender, not as the cultural meanings that are attached to a pregiven sex, but, in Judith Butler's formulation, 'as the … cultural means by which "sexed nature" or “a natural sex" is produced and established as…prior to culture' (Butler 1990: 7). Following Foucault, Butler argues that the notion of a 'natural' sex that is prior to culture and socialization is implicated in the production and maintenance of gendered power relations because it naturalizes the regulatory idea of a supposedly natural heterosexuality and, thus, reinforces the reproductive constraints on sexuality. In addition to his anti-essentialist view of the body and sexuality, Foucault insists on the corporeal reality of bodies. He argues that this rich and complex reality is oversimplified by the biological category of sex which groups together in an 'artificial unity' a range of disparate and unrelated biological functions and bodily pleasures. Thus, in The History of Sexuality, Foucault explains that: 'The purpose of the present study is in fact to show how deployments of power are directly connected to the body - to bodies, functions, physiological processes, sensations, and pleasures; far from the body having to be effaced, what is needed is to make it visible through an analysis in which the biological and the historical are not consecutive to one another … but are bound together in an increasingly complex fashion in accordance with the development of the modern technologies of power that take life as their objective. Hence I do not envisage a "history of mentalities" that would take account of bodies only through the manner in which they have been perceived and given meaning and value; but a "history of bodies" and the manner in which what is most material and most vital in them has been invested' (Foucault 1978: 151-2). Because Foucault's anti-essentialist account of the body is nevertheless attentive to the materiality of bodies it has been attractive to feminists concerned to expose the processes through which the female body is transformed into a feminine body. Thus, in claiming that the body is directly targeted and 'produced' by power and, thus, unknowable outside of its cultural significations, Foucault breaks down the distinction between a natural sex and a culturally constructed gender. Elizabeth Grosz argues that, unlike some other versions of poststructuralist theory which analyze the representation of bodies without due regard for their materiality, Foucault's insistence on the corporeal reality of the body which is directly molded by social and historical forces avoids the traditional gendered opposition between the body and culture. For this reason, she believes that, while Foucault fails to consider the issue of sexual difference, his thought may contribute to the feminist project of exploring the relation between social power and the production of sexually differentiated bodies (Grosz 1994). Not all feminists, however, are comfortable with Foucault's anti-naturalistic rhetoric. Kate Soper argues that by jettisoning the idea of a natural body, Foucault's anti-essentialism might 'lend itself to the forces of reaction in so far as it offers itself as a pre-emptive warning against any politics which aims at the removal of the constraining and distorting effects of cultural stereotyping' (Soper 1993: 33). Here Soper articulates a common feminist concern about the potentially conservative political consequences of Foucault's version of social constructivism. By contrast, Lois McNay argues that although Foucault's model of the relation between the body and power precludes the view that the body and sexuality might be liberated from power, it leaves room for the possibility that existing forms of sexuality and gendered power relations might be transformed. According to McNay, Foucault's history of sexuality 'exposes the contingent and socially determined nature of sexuality and, thereby, frees the body from the regulatory fiction of heterosexuality and opens up new realms in which bodily pleasures can be explored' (McNay 1992: 30). In another fruitful engagement with Foucault's work on the body and power, feminist scholars have embraced the notion of normalizing-disciplinary power for its potential to shed light on the social control of women in a contemporary context. For example, Sandra Bartky's appropriation of Foucault takes the form of a detailed examination of the subjection of the female body to disciplinary practices such as dieting, exercise and beauty regimens that produce a form of embodiment which conforms to prevailing norms of feminine beauty and attractiveness. On her account these disciplinary practices subjugate women, not by taking power away from them, but by generating skills and competencies that depend on the maintenance of a stereotypical form of feminine identity. Bartky suggests that women's seemingly willing acceptance of the various norms and practices that promote their larger disempowerment is due to the fact that challenging 'the patriarchal construction of the female body… may call into question that aspect of personal identity that is tied to the development of a sense of competence' (Bartky 1988: 77; Sawicki 1994: 293). In a similar vein, Susan Bordo brings Foucauldian insights to bear in her analysis of predominantly female eating disorders such as anorexia nervosa and bulimia (Bordo 1988). Following Foucault, she argues that these disorders might be understood as disciplinary technologies of the body. The anorexic woman takes to an extreme the practices to which women subject themselves in their efforts to conform to cultural norms of an ideal feminine form. In the figure of the anorexic Bordo sees an association of power and self-control with the achievement of a potentially fatal slenderness. For Bordo, this association is a stark illustration of the way in which disciplinary power is linked to the social control of women. Disciplinary technologies are particularly effective forms of social control because they take hold of individuals at the level of their bodies, gestures, desires and habits to create individuals who are attached to and, thus, the unwitting agents of their own subjection. In other words, disciplinary power fashions individuals who 'voluntarily' subject themselves to self-surveillance and self-normalization. Thus, like Bartky, Bordo finds Foucault’s work useful to explain women's collusion with patriarchal standards of femininity.

4. Subjectivity, Identity and Resistance

Although the use that Bartky and Bordo make of Foucault's insights into the operation of normalizing disciplinary power is a corrective to his failure to recognize the gendered nature of disciplinary techniques, some feminists have argued that their work reproduces a problematic dimension of Foucault's account of modern disciplinary power. Jana Sawicki explains that the problem faced by this kind of feminist appropriation of Foucault is its inability to account for effective resistance to disciplinary practices. Like Foucault, Bartky and Bordo envisage modern disciplinary power as ubiquitous and inescapable. Foucauldian power reduces individuals to docile and subjected bodies and thus seems to deny the possibility of freedom and resistance. According to Sawicki, 'Bartky and Bordo have portrayed forms of patriarchal power that insinuate themselves within subjects so profoundly that it is difficult to imagine how they (we) might escape. They describe our complicity in patriarchal practices of victimization without providing suggestions about how we might resist it' (Sawicki 1988: 293).

Feminist critics of Foucault like Nancy Hartsock argue that his failure to develop an adequate notion of resistance is a consequence of his reduction of individuals to effects of power relations. Hartsock echoes a widespread feminist concern that Foucault's understanding of power reduces individuals to docile bodies, to victims of disciplinary technologies or objects of power rather than subjects with the capacity to resist (Hartsock 1990: 171-2). The problem for Hartsock and others is that without the assumption of a subject or individual that pre-exists its construction by technologies of power, it becomes difficult to explain who resists power? If there are no ready-made individuals with interests that are defined prior to their construction by power, then what is the source of our resistance? Some feminists have responded to these concerns by claiming that, although Foucault rejects the idea that resistance can be grounded in a subject or self who pre-exists its construction by power, he does not deny the possibility of resistance to power. In his later work Foucault explains that his theory of power implies both the possibility and existence of forms of resistance. According to Foucault: 'there are no relations of power without resistances; the latter are all the more real and effective because they are formed right at the point where relations of power are exercised' (Foucault 1980: 142). Foucauldian resistance neither predates the power it opposes nor issues from a site external to power. Rather it relies upon and grows out of the situation against which it struggles. Foucault's understanding of resistance as internal to power refuses the utopian dream of achieving total emancipation from power. In the place of total liberation Foucault envisages more specific, local struggles against forms of subjection aimed at loosening the constraints on possibilities for action. He suggests that a key struggle in the present is against the tendency of normalizing-disciplinary power to tie individuals to their identities in constraining ways. It is, Foucault contends, because disciplinary practices limit the possibilities of what we can be by fixing our identities that the object of resistance must be 'to refuse what we are' - that is, to fracture the limitations imposed on us by normalizing identity categories. Foucault's notion of resistance as consisting, at least in the first instance, in a refusal of fixed, stable or naturalized identity has been met with some suspicion by feminists. Many feminists are reluctant to abandon a commitment 'to some essential, liberatory subject rooted in "women's experience" (or nature), as the starting point for emancipatory theory’ (Sawicki 1994: 289). For Hartsock, Foucault's perspective functions to preclude the possibility of feminist politics which, she claims, is necessarily an identity-based politics grounded in a conception of the identity, needs and interests of women. Some of the most exciting feminist appropriations of Foucault converge around this issue of identity and its role in politics. Judith Butler argues that Foucault's work provides feminists with the resources to think beyond the strictures of identity politics. According to Butler, feminists should be wary of the idea that politics needs to be based on a fixed idea of women's nature and interests. She argues that: 'The premature insistence on a stable subject of feminism, understood as a seamless category of women, inevitably generates multiple refusals to accept the category. These domains of exclusion reveal the coercive and regulatory consequences of that construction, even when the construction has been elaborated for emancipatory purposes. Indeed, the fragmentation within feminism and the paradoxical opposition to feminism from "women" whom feminism claims to represent suggest the necessary limits of identity politics' (Butler 1990: 4). Butler discerns at least two problems in the attempt to ground politics in an essential, naturalized female identity. She argues that the assertion of the category 'woman' as the ground for political action excludes, marginalizes and inevitably misrepresents those who do not recognize themselves within the terms of that identity. For Butler the appeal to identity both overlooks the differences in power and resources between, for example, third world and Western women, and tends to make these differences a source of conflict rather than a source of strength. She claims, moreover, that a feminist identity politics that appeals to a fixed 'feminist subject,' 'presumes, fixes and constrains the very ‘subjects' that it hopes to represent and liberate’ (Butler 1990: 148). In Foucault's presentation of identity as an effect Butler sees new possibilities for feminist political practice, possibilities that are precluded by positions that take identity to be fixed or foundational. One of the distinct advantages of Foucault's understanding of the constituted character of identity is, in Butler's view, that it enables feminism to politicize the processes through which stereotypical forms of masculine and feminine identity are produced. Butler's own work represents an attempt to explore these processes for the purposes of loosening the heterosexual restrictions on identity formation. In pursuing this project she argues that Foucault's characterization of identity as constructed does not mean that it is completely determined or artificial and arbitrary. Rather, a Foucauldian approach to identity production demonstrates the role played by cultural norms in regulating how we embody or perform our gender identities. According to Butler, gender identity is simply 'a set of repeated acts within a highly rigid regulatory frame that congeal over time to produce the appearance of substance, of a natural sort of being' (Butler 1990: 33). The regulatory power of the norms that govern our performances of gender is both disguised and strengthened by the assumption that gendered identities are natural and essential. Thus, for Butler, one of the most important feminist aims should be to challenge dominant gender norms by exposing the contingent acts that produce the appearance of an underlying 'natural' gender identity. Against the claim that feminist politics is necessarily an identity politics, Butler suggests that: 'If identities were no longer fixed as the premises of a political syllogism, and politics no longer understood as a set of practices derived from the alleged interests that belong to a set of ready-made subjects, a new configuration of politics would surely emerge from the ruins of the old' (Butler 1990: 149). Butler envisages this new configuration of politics as an anti-foundational coalition politics that would accept the need to act within the tensions produced by contradiction, fragmentation and diversity. While Butler's political vision emphasises strategies for resisting and subverting identity, Wendy Brown argues that contemporary feminism should be wary of both identity politics and the 'politics of resistance' associated with the work of Foucault and Butler. Brown argues that identity politics entails a commitment to the authenticity of women's experiences which functions to secure political authority. At the same time, however, most feminists wish to acknowledge that feminine identity and experience are constructed under patriarchal conditions. Brown suggests that this inconsistency in feminist political thought - acknowledging social construction on the one hand and attempting to preserve a realm of authentic experience free from construction on the other - might be explained by the fact that feminists are reluctant to give up the claim to moral authority that the appeal to the truth and innocence of woman's experience secures. By appealing to the silenced truth of women’s experience, feminists have been able to condemn the repressive effects of patriarchal power. For Brown the attempt to establish moral authority by asserting the hidden truth of women's experience and identity represents a rejection of politics. She argues that this kind of move in feminism: '… betrays a preference for extrapolitical terms and practices: for Truth (unchanging and incontestable) over politics (flux, contest, instability); for certainty and security (safety; immutability, privacy) over freedom (vulnerability, publicity); for discoveries (science) over decisions (judgments); for separable subjects armed with established rights over unwieldy and shifting pluralities adjudicating for themselves and their future on the basis of nothing more than their own habits and arguments' (Brown 1995: 37). Brown finds a similar failure to meet the challenges confronting contemporary politics in the 'politics of resistance' inspired by Foucault. As she sees it, the problem with resistance-as-politics is that it does not 'contain a critique, a vision, or grounds for organized collective efforts to enact either… [resistance] goes nowhere in particular, has no inherent attachments and hails no particular vision' (Brown 1995: 49). In light of these inadequacies, Brown calls for the politics of resistance to be supplemented by a political practices aimed at cultivating 'political spaces for posing and questioning political norms [and] for discussing the nature of "the good" for women' (Brown 1995: 49). The creation of such democratic spaces for discussion will, Brown argues, contribute to teaching us how to have public conversations with each other and enable us to argue from our diverse perspectives about a vision of the common good ("what I want for us") rather than from some assumed common identity (“who I am”).

5. Freedom, Power and Politics

The key problems identified by feminist critics as preventing too close a convergence between Foucault's work and feminism - his reduction of social agents to docile bodies and the lack of normative guidance in his model of power and resistance - are indirectly addressed by Foucault in his late work on ethics. Whereas in his earlier genealogies Foucault emphasized the processes through which individuals were subjected to power, in his later writings he turned his attention to practices of self-constitution or 'practices of freedom' which he called ethics.

The idea of practicing freedom is central to Foucault's exploration and analysis of the ethical practices of Antiquity. It refers to the ways in which individuals in Antiquity were led to exercise power over themselves in the attempt to constitute or transform their identity and behavior in the light of specific goals. What interests Foucault about these ethical practices and ancient 'arts of existence' is the kind of freedom they presuppose. He suggests that the freedom entailed in practicing the art of self-fashioning consists neither in resisting power nor in seeking to liberate the self from regulation. Rather, it entails the active and conscious arrogation of the power of regulation by individuals for the purposes of ethical and aesthetic self-transformation. In her reflections on Foucault's positive account of freedom, Sawicki notes that it offers a more affirmative alternative to his earlier emphasis on the reactive strategy of resistance to normalization (Sawicki 1998: 104). For the late Foucault, individuals are still understood to be shaped by their embeddedness in power relations, which means that their capacities for freedom and autonomous action are necessarily limited. However, he suggests that by actively deploying the techniques and models of self-formation that are 'proposed, suggested, imposed' upon them by society (Foucault 1988b: 291), individuals may creatively transform themselves and in the process supplant the normalization operating in pernicious modern technologies of the self (Sawicki 1998: 105). Sawicki sees a link between Foucault's notion of practices of freedom and Donna Haraway’s call for a cyborg politics that emphasizes the conscious creation of marginalized subjects capable of resisting domination. In a more critical vein, feminists like Jean Grimshaw and McNay argue that Foucault's promising turn to a more active model of subjectivity still leaves crucial issues unresolved. In Grimshaws formulation, Foucault evades the vital question of 'when forms of self-discipline or self-surveillance can … be seen as exercises of autonomy or self-creation, or when they should be seen, rather, as forms of discipline to which the self is subjected, and by which autonomy is constrained' (Grimshaw 1993: 66; McNay 1992: 74). In response to this criticism, Moya Lloyd suggests that it is Foucault's earlier notion of genealogy as critique which allows us to distinguish between autonomous practices of the self and technologies of normalization. For Lloyd, the Foucauldian practice of critique - a practice which involves the effort to recognize, decipher and problematize the ways in which the self is produced - generates possibilities for alternative practices of the self and, thus, for more autonomous experiments in self-formation. Lloyd explains that 'it is not the activity of self-fashioning in itself that is crucial. It is the way in which that self-fashioning, when allied to critique, can produce sites of contestation over the meanings and contours of identity, and over the ways in which certain practices are mobilized' (Lloyd: 1988: 250). With the introduction of a notion of freedom in his late work, Foucault also clarifies the normative grounds for his opposition to certain forms of power. In his discussion of ethics, Foucault suggests that individuals are not limited to reacting against power, but may alter power relationships in ways that expand their possibilities for action. Thus, Foucault's work on ethics can be linked to his concern to counter domination, that is, forms of power that limit the possibilities for the autonomous development of the self's capacities. By distinguishing power relations that are mutable, flexible and reversible, from situations of domination in which resistance is foreclosed, Foucault seeks to encourage practices of liberty 'that will allow us to play … games of power with as little domination as possible' (Foucault 1988b: 298). Sawicki argues that Foucault's notion of practices of freedom has the potential to broaden our understanding of what it is to engage in emancipatory politics. In Foucault's conception of freedom as a practice aimed at minimizing domination, Sawicki discerns an implicit critique of traditional emancipatory politics which tends to conceive of liberty as a state free from every conceivable social constraint. Following Foucault, Sawicki argues that the problem with this notion of emancipation is that it does not go far enough: 'Reversing power positions without altering relations of power is rarely liberating. Neither is it a sufficient condition of liberation to throw off the yoke of domination' (Sawicki 1998: 102). If, as Foucault suggests, freedom exists only in being exercised and is, thus, a permanent struggle against what will otherwise be done to and for individuals, it is dangerous to imagine it as a state of being that can be guaranteed by laws and institutions. By insisting that liberation from domination is not enough to guarantee freedom, Foucault points to the importance of establishing new patterns of behaviour, attitudes and cultural forms that work to empower the vulnerable and, in this way, to ensure that mutable relations of power do not congeal into states of domination. Thus, for Sawicki, the value of Foucault's late work for feminism consists in the conceptual tools that it provides to think beyond traditional emancipatory theories and practices.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bartky, S., 'Foucault, femininity and the modernization of patriarchal power' in I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds), Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Bordo, S., 'Anorexia Nervosa: Psychopathology as the Crystallization of Culture' in I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds) Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Brown, W., 'Postmodern Exposures, Feminist Hesitations' in States of Injury: power and freedom in late modernity, Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1995.
  • Butler, J., Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity, NY: Routledge, 1990.
  • Butler, J., Bodies that Matter: On the Discursive Limits of "Sex", NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Diamond, I. & Quinby, L., (eds.) Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Dreyfus, H. and Rabinow, P., Michel Foucault: Beyond Structuralism and Hermeneutics, Sussex: The Harvester Press, 1982.
  • Foucault, M., Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison, trans. A. Sheridan, Harmondsworth: Peregrine, 1977.
  • Foucault, M., The History of Sexuality, translated by R. Hurley, Penguin Books, 1978.
  • Foucault, M., 'Body/Power' and ‘Truth and Power’ in C. Gordon (ed.) Michel Foucault: Power/Knowledge, U.K.: Harvester, 1980.
  • Foucault, M., 'The subject and power' in H. Dreyfus and P. Rabinow, Michel Foucault: Beyond Structuralism and Hermeneutics, Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1982.
  • Foucault, M., 'What is Enlightenment?' in The Foucault Reader, P. Rabinow (ed.) NY: Pantheon, 1984a.
  • Foucault, M., 'On the genealogy of ethics: an overview of work in progress' in The Foucault Reader, P. Rabinow (ed.) NY: Pantheon, 1984b.
  • Foucault, M., Politics, Philosophy, Culture: Interviews and Other Writings, 1977-1984, L. Kritzman (ed.), London: Routledge, 1988a.
  • Foucault, M., 'The ethic of care for the self as a practice of freedom' in J. Bernhauer and D. Rasmussen (eds), The Final Foucault, Cambridge: Mass.: MIT Press, 1988b.
  • Fraser, N., Unruly Practices: power, discourse and gender in contemporary social theory, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1989.
  • Grimshaw, J., 'Practices of Freedom' in Up Against Foucault, C. Ramazanoglu (ed.), London and NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Grosz, E., Volatile Bodies: Toward a Corporeal Feminism, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994.
  • Gutting, G., (ed.) The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Hacking, I., 'The Archaeology of Knowledge' in D. Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: a critical reader, NY: Basil Blackwell, 1986.
  • Hartsock, N., 'Foucault on power: a theory for women?' in L. Nicholson (ed.), Feminism/Postmodernism, London & NY: Routledge, 1990.
  • Hekman, S. (ed.) Feminist Interpretations of Michel Foucault, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania University Press, 1996.
  • Lloyd, M., 'A Feminist Mapping of Foucauldian Politics' in Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds), Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • McNay, L., Foucault: a critical introduction, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1994.
  • McNay, L., Foucault and Feminism: Power, Gender and the Self, Polity Press, 1992.
  • Ramazanoglu, C., Up Against Foucault: Explorations of Some Tensions Between Foucault and Feminism, London & NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Rouse, J., 'Power/Knowledge' in Gary Gutting (ed) The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Sawicki, J., 'Feminism and the Power of Discourse' in J. Arac (ed.) After Foucault: Humanistic Knowledge, Postmodern Challenges, New Brunswick and London: Rutgers University Press, 1988, pp. 161-178.
  • Sawicki, J., 'Foucault, feminism, and questions of identity' in ed. G. Gutting, The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Sawicki, J., 'Feminism, Foucault and "Subjects" of Power and Freedom' in The Later Foucault: politics and philosophy, J. Moss (ed.), London; Thousand Oaks: Sage Publications, 1998.
  • Soper, K., 'Productive contradictions', Up Against Foucault: Explorations of Some Tensions Between Foucault and Feminism, London & NY: Routledge, 1993.

Author Information

Aurelia Armstrong
University of Queensland

Paul Ricoeur (1913—2005)

RicoeurPaul Ricoeur was among the most impressive philosophers of the 20th century continental philosophers, both in the unusual breadth and depth of his philosophical scholarship and in the innovative nature of his thought. He was a prolific writer, and his work is essentially concerned with that grand theme of philosophy: the meaning of life. Ricoeur's "tensive" style focuses on the tensions running through the very structure of human being. His constant preoccupation was with a hermeneutic of the self, fundamental to which is the need we have for our lives to be made intelligible to us. Ricoeur's flagship in this endeavor is his narrative theory. Though a Christian philosopher whose work in theology is well-known and respected, his philosophical writings do not rely upon theological concepts, and are appreciated by non-Christians and Christians alike. His most widely read works are The Rule of Metaphor, From Text to Action, and Oneself As Another, and the three volumes of Time and Narrative. His other significant books include Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences, Conflict of Interpretations, The Symbolism of Evil, Freud and Philosophy, and Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Style
  3. Influences
  4. The Philosophy
  5. Time and Narrative
  6. Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected Ricoeur Bibliography
    2. Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Jean Paul Gustave Ricoeur was born on February 27, 1913, at Valence, France, and he died in Chatenay-Malabry, France on May 20, 2005. He lost both his parents within his first few years of his life and was raised with his sister Alice by his paternal grandparents, both of whom were devout Protestants. Ricoeur was a bookish child and successful student. He was awarded a scholarship to study at the Sorbonne in 1934, and afterwards was appointed to his first teaching position at Colmar, Alsace. While at the Sorbonne he first met Gabriel Marcel, who was to become a lifelong friend and philosophical influence. In 1935 he was married to Simone Lejas, with whom he has raised five children.

Ricoeur served in World War II – spending most of it as a prisoner of war – and was awarded the Croix de Guerre. He was interred with Mikel Dufrenne, with whom he later wrote a book on the work of Karl Jaspers. After the war Ricoeur returned to teaching, taking positions at the University of Strasbourg, the Sorbonne, University of Paris at Nanterre, the University of Louvain and University of Chicago. Ricoeur is a traditional philosopher in the sense that his work is highly systematic and steeped in the classics of Western philosophy. His is a reflective philosophy, that is, one that considers the most fundamental philosophical problems to concern self-understanding. While Ricoeur retains subjectivity at the heart of philosophy, his is no abstract Cartesian-style subject; the subject is always a situated subject, an embodied being anchored in a named and dated physical, historical and social world. For this reason his work is sometimes described as philosophical anthropology. Ricoeur is a post-structuralist hermeneutic philosopher who employs a model of textuality as the framework for his analysis of meaning, which extends across writing, speech, art and action. Ricoeur considers human understanding to be cogent only to the extent that it implicitly deploys structures and strategies characteristic of textuality. It is Ricoeur's view that our self-understandings, and indeed history itself , are "fictive", that is, subject to the productive effects of the imagination through interpretation. For Ricoeur, the human subjectivity is primarily linguistically designated and mediated by symbols. He states that the "problematic of existence" is given in language and must be worked out in language and discourse. Ricoeur refers to his hermeneutic method as a "hermeneutics of suspicion" because discourse both reveals and conceals something about the nature of being. Unlike post-structuralists such as Foucault and Derrida, for whom subjectivity is nothing more than an effect of language, Ricoeur anchors subjectivity in the human body and the material world, of which language is a kind of second order articulation. In the face of the fragmentation and alienation of post-modernity, Ricoeur offers his narrative theory as the path to a unified and meaningful life; indeed, to the good life.

2. Style

Ricoeur has developed a theoretical style that can best be described as "tensive". He weaves together heterogeneous concepts and discourses to form a composite discourse in which new meanings are created without diminishing the specificity and difference of the constitutive terms. Ricoeur's work on metaphor and on the human experience of time are perhaps the best examples of this method, although his entire philosophy is explicitly such a discourse. For example, in What Makes Us Think? Ricoeur discusses the nature of mental life in terms of the tension between our neurobiological conceptions of mind and our phenomenological concepts. Similarly, in the essay "Explanation and Understanding" he discusses human behavior in terms of the tension between concepts of material causation, and the language of actions and motives. The tensive style is in keeping with what Ricoeur regards as basic, ontological tensions inherent in the peculiar being that is human existence, namely, the ambiguity of belonging to both the natural world and the world of action (through freedom of the will). Accordingly, Ricoeur insists that philosophy find a way to contain and express those tensions, and so his work ranges across diverse schools of philosophical thought, bringing together insights and analysis from both the Anglo-American and European traditions, as well as from literary studies, political science and history.

The tensions are played out in our ability to take different perspectives on ourselves and so to formulate diverse approaches and methods in understanding ourselves. The different theoretical frameworks employed in philosophy and the sciences are not simply the result of ignorance or power. They are the result of tensions that run through the very structure of human being; tensions which Ricoeur describes as "fault lines." Ricoeur's entire body of work is an attempt to identify and map out the intersections of these numerous and irreducible lines that comprise our understandings of the human world. Ricoeur calls these "fault lines" because they are lines that can intersect in different ways in all the different aspects of human lives, giving lives different meanings. However, as points of intersection of discourses, these meanings can come apart. Ricoeur argues that the stability we enjoy with respect to the meanings of our lives is a tentative stability, subject to the influences of the material world, including the powers and afflictions of one's body, the actions of other people and institutions, and one's own emotional and cognitive states. Given the fundamental nature of these tensions, Ricoeur argues that it is ultimately poetics (exemplified in narrative), rather than philosophy that provides the structures and synthetic strategies by which understanding and a coherent sense of self and life is possible.

3. Influences

Ricoeur acknowledges his indebtedness to several key figures in the tradition, most notably, Aristotle, Kant, Hegel and Heidegger. Aristotelian teleology pervades Ricoeur's textual hermeneutics, and is most obvious in his adoption of a narrative approach. The concepts of "muthos" and "mimesis" in Aristotle's Poetics form the basis for Ricoeur's account of narrative "emplotment," which he enjoins with the innovative powers of the Kantian productive imagination within a general theory of poetics.

The influence of Hegel is manifest in Ricoeur's employment of a method he describes as a "refined dialectic." For Ricoeur, the dialectic is a "relative moment[s] in a complex process called interpretation" (Explanation and Understanding", 150). Like Hegel, the dialectic involves identifying key oppositional terms in a debate, and then proceeding to articulate their synthesis into a new, more developed concept. However, this synthesis does not have the uniformity of a Hegelian synthesis. Ricoeur's method entails showing how the meanings of two seemingly opposed terms are implicitly informed by, and borrow from, each other. Within the dialectic, the terms maintain their differences at the same time that a common "ground" is formed. However, the common ground is simply the ground of their mutual presupposition. Ricoeur's dialectic, then, is a unity of continuity and discontinuity. For example, in "Explanation and Understanding" Ricoeur argues that scientific explanation implicitly deploys a background hermeneutic understanding that exceeds the resources of explanation. At the same time, hermeneutic understanding necessarily relies upon the systematic process of explanation. Neither the natural sciences nor the human sciences are fully autonomous disciplines. A key dialectic that runs through Ricoeur's entire corpus is the dialectic of same and other. This is a foundational dialectic for him, and so, as might be expected, it structures his discussions and dissections of every field of philosophy he enters: selfhood, justice, love, morality, personal identity, knowledge, time, language, metaphor, action, aesthetics, metaphysics, and so on. Unlike the Hegelian dialectic, for Ricoeur, there is no absolute culminating point. There is, nevertheless, a kind of absolute, an objective existence that is revealed indirectly through the dialectic. This is most evident in the third volume of Time and Narrative, where he argues that phenomenological time presupposes an objective order of time (cosmological time), and in The Rule of Metaphor, where he argues that language belongs to, and is expressive of, extra-linguistic reality. Despite this apparent concession to realism, Ricoeur insists that the objective cannot be known as such, but merely grasped indirectly and analytically. Here, the Kantian influence comes to the fore. For Ricoeur, objective reality is the contemporary equivalent of Kantian noumena: although it can never itself become an object of knowledge, it is a kind of necessary thought, a limiting concept, implied in objects of knowledge. This view informs Ricoeur's "tensive" style. Although we can know, philosophically that there is an objective reality, and, in that sense, a metaphysical constraint on human existence, we can never understand human existence simply in terms of this objectivity. What we must appeal to in order to understand our existence are our substantive philosophical and ethical concepts and norms. This sets up an inevitable tension between the contingency of those norms and the brute fact of objective reality, evidenced in our experience of the involuntary, for example, as aging and dying. Again, Kant looms large. We necessarily regard ourselves from two perspectives: as the author of our actions in the practical world, and as part of, or passive to, cause and effect in the natural world. Such is the inherently ambiguous and tensive nature of human, mortal subjects. It is this condition, then, with which philosophy must grapple. And it is to this condition that Ricoeur offers narrative as the appropriate framework.

4. The Philosophy

There are two closely related questions that animate all of Ricoeur's work, and which he considers to be fundamental to philosophy: "Who am I?" and "How should I live?" The first question has been neglected by much of contemporary analytical and post-modern philosophy. Consequently, those philosophies lack the means to address the second question. Postmodernism self-consciously rejects traditional processes of identity formation, depicting them as familial and political power relations premised upon dubious metaphysical assumptions about gender, race and mind. At the same time, contemporary philosophy of mind reduces questions of "who?" to questions of "what?", and in doing so, closes down considerations of self while rendering the moral question one of mere instrumentality or utility. In relation to the question "Who am I?", Ricoeur acknowledges a long-standing debt to Marcel and Heidegger, and to a lesser extent to Merleau-Ponty. To the moral question, the debt is to Aristotle and Kant. In addressing the question "who am I?" Ricoeur sets out first to understand the nature of selfhood – to understand the being whose nature it is to enquire into itself.

In this endeavor, Ricoeur's philosophy is driven by the desire to provide an account that will do justice to the tensions and ambiguities which make us human, and which underpin our fallibility. Ricoeur's interest here can be noted as early as The Voluntary and The Involuntary, drafted during his years as a prisoner of war. There he explores the involuntary constraints to which we are necessarily subject in virtue of our being bodily mortal creatures, and the voluntariness necessary to the idea of ourselves as the agents of our actions. We have, as he later describes it, a "double allegiance", an allegiance to the material world of cause and effect, and to the phenomenal world of the freedom of the will by which we tear ourselves away from the laws of nature through action. This conception of the double nature of the self lies at the core of Ricoeur's philosophy. Ricoeur rejects the idea that a self is a metaphysical entity; there is no entity, "the self," there is only selfhood. Selfhood is an intersubjectively constituted capacity for agency and self-ascription that can be had by individual human beings. Selfhood proper is neither simply an abstract nor an animal self-awareness, but both. It essentially involves an active grasp of oneself as a "who"--that is, as a person who is the subject of a concrete situation, a situation characterized by material and phenomenal qualities. This entails understanding oneself as a named person with a time and place of birth, linked to other similarly named persons and to certain ethnic and cultural traditions, living in a dated and named place. In Oneself As Another Ricoeur describes how the complexity of the question of "who?" opens directly onto a certain way of articulating the question of personal identity: "how the self can be at one and the same time a person of whom we speak and a subject who designates herself in the first person while addressing a second person. . . The difficulty will be . . . understanding how the third person is designated in discourse as someone who designates himself as a first person (34-5)". Drawing on Heidegger's notion of Dasein, Ricoeur goes on to write that "To say self is not to say myself . . . the passage from selfhood to mineness is marked by the clause "in each case" . . . The self . . . is in each case mine" (OAA 180). What he means by this is that each person has to take one's selfhood as one's own; each must take oneself as who one is; one must "attest" to oneself. Subjectivity, or selfhood, is for Ricoeur, a dialectic of activity and passivity because we are beings with a "double nature," structured along the fault lines of the voluntary and the involuntary, beings given to ourselves as something to be known. Ricoeur shares Marcel's view that the answer to the question "Who am I?" can never be fully explicated. This is because, in asking "Who am I?", "I" who pose the question necessarily fall within the domain of enquiry; I am both seeker and what is sought. This peculiar circularity gives a "questing" and dialectical character to selfhood, which now requires a hermeneutic approach. This circularity has its origins in the nature of embodied subjectivity. Ricoeur's account is built upon Marcel's conception of embodied subjectivity as a "fundamental predicament"(Marcel, 1965). The predicament lies in the anti-dualist realization that "I" and my body are not metaphysically distinct entities. My body cannot be abstracted from its being mine. Whatever states I may attribute to my body as its states, I do so only insofar as they are attributes of mine. My body is both something that I am and something that I have: it is "my body" that imagines, perceives and experiences. The unity of "my body" is a unity sui generis. Yet my body is also that over which I exercise a certain instrumentality through my agency. However, the agency that effects that instrumentality is nothing other than "my body." There is no I-body relation; the primitive term here is "my body." The inherent ambiguity of the "carnate body" or "corps-sujet" can be directly experienced by clasping one's own hands (an example often employed by Marcel and Merleau-Ponty). In this experience the distinction between subject and object becomes blurred: it isn't clear which hand is being touched and which is touching; each hand oscillates between the role of agent and object, without ever being both simultaneously. One cannot feel oneself feeling. This example is supposed to demonstrate two points: first, that the ambiguity of my body prevents the complete objectification of myself, and second, that ambiguity extends to all perception. Perception is not simply passive, but rather, involves an active reception (a concept that Ricoeur takes up and develops in his account of the ontology of the self and one's own body in Oneself As Another, see 319–329). In other words, my body has an active role in structuring my perceptions, and so, the meaning of my perceptions needs to be interpreted in the context of my bodily situation. The non-coincidence of myself and my body constitutes a "fault line" within the structure of subjectivity. The result is that knowledge of myself and the world is not constituted by more or less accurate facts, but rather, is a composite discourse--a discourse which charts the intersection of the objective, intersubjective and subjective aspects of lived experience. On this view, all knowledge, including my knowledge of my own existence, is mediate and so calls for interpretation. This also means that self-understanding can never be grasped by the kind of introspective immediacy celebrated by Descartes. Instead, as human beings we are never quite "at one" with ourselves; we are fallible creatures. Thus, who I am is not an objective fact to be discovered, but rather something that I must achieve or create, and to which I must attest. On Ricoeur's view, the question "Who am I ?" is a question specific to a certain kind of being, namely, being a subject of a temporal, material, linguistic and social unity. The ability to grasp oneself as a concrete subject of such a world requires a complex mode of understanding capable of integrating discourses of quite heterogenous kinds, including, importantly, different orders of time. It is to the temporal dimension of selfhood that Ricoeur has most directly addressed his hermeneutic philosophy and narrative model of understanding.

5. Time and Narrative

Central to Ricoeur's defense of narrative is its capacity to represent the human experience of time. Such a capacity is an essential requisite for a reflective philosophy. Ricoeur sets out his account of "human time" in Time and Narrative, Volume 3. He points out that we experience time in two different ways. We experience time as linear succession, we experience the passing hours and days and the progression of our lives from birth to death. This is cosmological time--time expressed in the metaphor of the "river" of time. The other is phenomenological time; time experienced in terms of the past, present and future. As self-aware embodied beings, we not only experience time as linear succession, but we are also oriented to the succession of time in terms of what has been, what is, and what will be. Ricoeur's concept of "human time" is expressive of a complex experience in which phenomenological time and cosmological time are integrated. For example, we understand the full meaning of "yesterday" or "today" by reference to their order in a succession of dated time. To say "Today is my birthday" is to immediately invoke both orders of time: a chronological date to which is anchored the phenomenological concept of "birthday." Ricoeur describes this anchoring as the "inscription" of phenomenological time on cosmological time (TN3 109).

These two conceptions of time have traditionally been seen in opposition, but Ricoeur argues that they share a relation of mutual presupposition. The order of "past-present-future" within phenomenological time presupposes the succession characteristic of cosmological time. The past is always before the present which is always after the past and before the future. The order of succession is invariable, and this order is not part of the concepts of past, present or future considered merely as existential orientations. On the other hand, within cosmological time, the identification of supposedly anonymous instants of time as "before" or "after" within the succession borrows from the phenomenological orientation to past and future. Ricoeur argues that any philosophical model for understanding human existence must employ a composite temporal framework. The only suitable candidate here is the narrative model. Ricoeur links narrative's temporal complexity to Aristotle's characterization of narrative as "the imitation of an action". Ricoeur's account of the way in which narrative represents the human world of acting (and, in its passive mode, suffering) turns on three stages of interpretation that he calls mimesis1 (prefiguration of the field of action), mimesis2 (configuration of the field of action), and mimesis3 (refiguration of the field of action). Mimesis1 describes the way in which the field of human acting is always already prefigured with certain basic competencies, for example, competency in the conceptual network of the semantics of action (expressed in the ability to raise questions of who, how, why, with whom, against whom, etc.); in the use of symbols (being able to grasp one thing as standing for something else); and competency in the temporal structures governing the syntagmatic order of narration (the "followability" of a narrative). Mimesis2 concerns the imaginative configuration of the elements given in the field of action at the level of mimesis1. Mimesis2 concerns narrative "emplotment." Ricoeur describes this level as "the kingdom of the as if" Narrative emplotment brings the diverse elements of a situation into an imaginative order, in just the same way as does the plot of a story. Emplotment here has a mediating function. It configures events, agents and objects and renders those individual elements meaningful as part of a larger whole in which each takes a place in the network that constitutes the narrative's response to why, how, who, where, when, etc. By bringing together heterogeneous factors into its syntactical order emplotment creates a "concordant discordance," a tensive unity which functions as a redescription of a situation in which the internal coherence of the constitutive elements endows them with an explanatory role. A particularly useful feature of narrative which becomes apparent at the level mimesis2 is the way in which the linear chronology of emplotment is able to represent different experiences of time. What is depicted as the "past" and the "present" within the plot does not necessarily correspond to the "before" and "after" of its linear, episodic structure. For example, a narrative may begin with a culminating event, or it may devote long passages to events depicted as occurring within relatively short periods of time. Dates and times can be disconnected from their denotative function; grammatical tenses can be changed, and changes in the tempo and duration of scenes create a temporality that is "lived" in the story that does not coincide with either the time of the world in which the story is read, nor the time that the unfolding events are said to depict. In Volume 2 of Time and Narrative, Ricoeur's analyses of Mrs. Dalloway, The Magic Mountain and Remembrance of Things Past centre on the diverse variations of time produced by the interplay of a three tiered structure of time: the time of narrating; the narrated time; and the fictive experience of time produced through "the conjunction/disjunction of the time it takes to narrate and narrated time" (TN2 77). Narrative configuration has at hand a rich array of strategies for temporal signification. Another key feature of mimesis2 is the ability of the internal logic of the narrative unity (created by emplotment) to endow the connections between the elements of the narrative with necessity. In this way, emplotment forges a causal continuity from a temporal succession, and so creates the intelligibility and credibility of the narrative. Ricoeur argues that the temporal order of the events depicted in the narrative is simultaneous with the construction of the necessity that connects those elements into a conceptual unity: from the structure of one thing after another arises the conceptual relation of one thing because of another. It is this conversion that so well "imitates" the continuity demanded by a life, and makes it the ideal model for personal identity and self-understanding. Mimesis3 concerns the integration of the imaginative or "fictive" perspective offered at the level of mimesis2 into actual, lived experience. Ricoeur's model for this is a phenomenology of reading, which he describes as "the intersection of the world of the text and the world of the reader"(TN1 71). Not only are our life stories "written," they must be "read," and when they are read they are taken as one's own and integrated into one's identity and self-understanding. Mimesis3 effects the integration of the hypothetical to the real by anchoring the time depicted (or recollected or imputed) in a dated "now" and "then" of actual, lived time. Mimesis is a cyclical interpretative process because it is inserted into the passage of cosmological time. As time passes, our circumstances give rise to new experiences and new opportunities for reflection. We can redescribe our past experiences, bringing to light unrealized connections between agents, actors, circumstances, motives or objects, by drawing connections between the events retold and events that have occurred since, or by bringing to light untold details of past events. Of course, narrative need not have a happy ending. The concern of narrative is coherence and structure, not the creation of a particular kind of experience. Nevertheless, the possibility of redescription of the past offers us the possibility of re-imagining and reconstructing a future inspired by hope. It is this potentially inexhaustible process that is the fuel for philosophy and literature.

6. Ethics

Besides the metaphysical complexity and heterogeneity of the human situation, one of Ricoeur's deepest concerns is the tentative, even fragile status of the coherence of a life. His conception of ethics is directly tied to his conception of the narrative self. Because selfhood is something that must be achieved and something dependent upon the regard, words and actions of others, as well as chancy material conditions, one can fail to achieve selfhood, or one's sense of who one is can fall apart. The narrative coherence of one's life can be lost, and with that loss comes the inability to regard oneself as the worthy subject of a good life; in other words, the loss of self-esteem.

Ricoeur's ethics is teleological. He argues that human life has an ethical aim, and that aim is self-esteem: "the interpretation of ourselves mediated by the ethical evaluation of our actions. Self-esteem is itself an evaluation process indirectly applied to ourselves as selves" (The Narrative Path, 99). In short, self-esteem means being able to attest to oneself as being the worthy subject of a good life, where "good" is an evaluation informed not simply by one's own subjective criteria, but rather by intersubjective criteria to which one attests. This entails another moral concept: that of imputation. As the subject of my actions, I am responsible for what I do; I am the subject to whom my actions can be imputed and whose character is to be interpreted in the light of those actions. Ricoeur describes the ethical perspective that arises from this view of the subject as "aiming at the good life" with and for others, in just institutions" (OAA 172). Such a perspective merely spells out the premise of this practical and material conception of selfhood, with its presupposition of the world of action, lived with others. For Ricoeur, a life can have an aim because the teleological structure of action extends over a whole life, understood within the narrative framework. The ethical life is achieved by aiming to live well with others in just institutions. Ricoeur's view of selfhood has it that we are utterly reliant upon each other. While Ricoeur emphasizes the importance of the first person perspective and the notion of personal responsibility, his is no philosophy of the radical individual. He emphasizes that we are "mutually vulnerable", and so the fate (self-esteem) of each of us is tied up with the fate of others. This situation has a normative dimension: we have an indebtedness to each other, a duty to care for each other and to engender self-respect and justice, all of which are necessary to the creation and preservation of self-esteem. While duty runs deep, Ricoeur argues that it is nevertheless preceded by a certain reciprocity. In order to feel commanded by duty, one must first have the capacity to hear and respond to the demand of the Other. That is, there must be some fundamental, primordial openness and orientation to others for the power of duty to be felt. Prior to duty there must be a basic reciprocity, which underlies our mutual vulnerability and from which duty, as well as the possibility of friendship and justice, arises. Here, Ricoeur emphasizes the ethical primacy of acting and suffering. Ricoeur calls this phenomenon "solicitude" or "benevolent spontaneity" (OAA 190). It makes the relation of self and Other (and thus, ethics) primordial, or ontological – hence the title of Ricoeur's book on ethics, Oneself As Another. Self-esteem is said to arise from a primitive reciprocity of spontaneous, benevolent feelings, feelings which one is also capable of directing toward oneself, but only through the benevolence of others. This fundamental reciprocity is prior to the activity of giving. This can be demonstrated in the situation of sympathy, where it is the Other's suffering (not acting) that one shares. Here, Ricoeur argues that "from the suffering Other there comes a giving that is no longer drawn from the power of acting and existing, but precisely from weakness itself" (OAA 188-9). In this case, the suffering Other is unable to act, and yet gives. What the suffering Other gives to he or she who shares this suffering is precisely the knowledge of their shared vulnerability and the experience of the spontaneous benevolence required to bear that knowledge. As might be supposed from Ricoeur's view of embodied subjectivity, one is always already an Other to oneself. So, love and understanding for others, and love and understanding for oneself, are two sides of the same sheet of paper, so to speak. One becomes who one is through relations with the Other, whether in the instance of one's own body or another's. Reciprocity forms the basis of those productive and self-affirming relations central to so much of ethics, namely friendship and justice. Its corruption leads to self-loathing and the destruction of self-esteem, which goes hand-in-hand with harm to others and injustice. For Ricoeur, friendship and justice become the chief virtues because of their crucial role in the well-being of selfhood, and thus, in maintaining the conditions of possibility of selfhood. Friends and just institutions not only protect against the suffering of self-destruction to which one is always vulnerable, they provide the means for reconstructing and redeeming damaged lives. The theme of redemption runs right through Ricoeur's work, and no doubt it has a religious origin. However, the notion of redemption can be viewed in secular terms as the counterpart to the constructive nature of one's identity, and the temporal complexity of the human situation which calls for interpretation.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Marcel, Gabriel. Being and Having: an existentialist diary (New York: Harper and Row, 1965).
  • Marcel, Gabriel. The Mystery of Being: 1, Reflection and Mystery (Chicago: Henry Regnery, 1960).
  • Merleau-Ponty, Maurice.  The Visible and The Invisible, trans. Alphonso Lingis (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1968).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. "Explanation and Understanding" in From Text to Action, trans. Kathleen Blamey and John Thompson (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1991).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. "Humans as the Subject Matter of Philosophy" in The Narrative Path, The Later Works of Paul Ricoeur, eds. T. Peter Kemp and David Rasmussen (Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press, 1988).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. "Intellectual Autobiography" in Lewis Edwin Hahn, ed., The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XXII (Chicago, Illinois: Open Court, 1995).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. "What is Dialectical?" in Freedom and Morality ed. John Bricke, (Lawrence: University of Kansas, 1976).

a. Selected Ricoeur Bibliography

  • History and Truth, trans. Charles A Kelbley, (Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1965)
  • Fallible Man, trans. Charles A Kelbley (New York: Fordham University Press, 1986)
  • Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary (Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1966)
  • Husserl: An Analysis of his Phenomenology, trans. E. G. Ballard and L. E. Embree (Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1966)
  • The Symbolism of Evil, trans. E. Buchanan (New York and Evanston: Harper-Row, 1967)
  • Freud and Philosophy: an essay on interpretation, trans. D. Savage (New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 1970)
  • Tragic Wisdom and Beyond, with Gabriel Marcel, trans. P. McCormick and S. Jolin (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1973)
  • The Conflict of Interpretations. Essays in Hermeneutics, trans. D. Ihde (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1974)
  • The Rule of Metaphor, multidisciplinary studies in the creation of meaning in language (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1978)
  • Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences. Essays on Language, Action and Interpretation edited and trans. J. B. Thompson (Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 1981)
  • Time and Narrative, Volumes 1-3, trans. Kathleen Blamey and David Pellauer (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1984 -1988)
  • From Text to Action, trans. Kathleen Blamey and John Thompson (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1991)
  • Oneself as Another, trans. Kathleen Blamey (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992)
  • Tolerance between intolerance and the intolerable (Providence: Berghahn Books, 1996)
  • Critique and conviction : conversations with FranÁois Azouvi and Marc de Launay trans. Kathleen Blamey (New York: Columbia University Press, 1998)
  • Thinking Biblically: Exegetical and Hermeneutical Studies, with Andre LeCocque (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1998)
  • The Just, trans. David Pellauer (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 2000)
  • What Makes Us Think? A Neuroscientist and a Philosopher Argue About Ethics, Human Nature and the Brain, with Jean-Pierre Changeux, trans. M. B. DeBevoise (Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press, 2000)

b. Further Reading

  • Henry Isaac Venema: Identifying selfhood : imagination, narrative, and hermeneutics in the thought of Paul Ricoeur (Albany, N.Y. : State University of New York Press, 2000)
  • Bernard P. Dauenhauer : Paul Ricoeur : the promise and risk of politics (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1998)
  • Charles E. Regan, Paul Ricoeur, his life and his work (Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press, 1996)
  • Lewis Edwin Hahn, ed. The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XXII (Chicago, Illinois: Open Court, 1995)
  • David Wood, ed. On Paul Ricoeur (London & New York: Routledge, 1991)
  • S.H. Clark: Paul Ricoeur (London and New York: Routledge, 1990)
  • Patrick L. Bourgeois and Frank Schalow: Traces of understanding: a profile of Heidegger's and Ricoeur's hermeneutics (Amsterdam and Atlanta, GA : Rodopi, 1990)
  • T. Peter Kemp and David Rasmussen: The Narrative Path: The Later Works of Paul Ricoeur (Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press, 1989)
  • John B. Thompson: Critical hermeneutics : a study in the thought of Paul Ricoeur and Jurgen Habermas (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981)
  • Charles E. Reagan ed: Studies in the Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur (Athens: Ohio University Press, 1979)
  • Don Ihde, Hermeneutic Phenomenology: The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1971)

Author Information

Kim Atkins
University of Tasmania

St. Louis Hegelians

The common name given to a group of amateur philosophers founded and led by William Torrey Harris (1835-1909) and Henry Conrad Brokmeyer (1828-1906). Harris, a New Englander born in Connecticut and educated at Yale, first became acquainted with idealism through the Transcendentalists, mainly from his attendance in 1857 at the Orphic Seer's Conversations of Amos Bronson Alcott (1799-1888). The experience inspired Harris to leave Yale before obtaining a degree, and set off west to St. Louis to seek his vocation. Initially he took a position teaching shorthand in the St. Louis Public Schools, but he quickly advanced through the system, eventually becoming Superintendent of Schools, a position he held from 1867 to 1880. Brokmeyer was a Prussian immigrant who arrived in New York as a young man of sixteen. Bold and restless in temperament, he made his way westward, acquiring a small fortune by running a shoe factory in Mississippi. Desiring to further his education, he abandoned his business pursuits to enter Georgetown University in Kentucky, but his quarrelsome character led to his departure for Brown University in Providence, Rhode Island, only to leave that institution as well after a heated debate with President Wayland. The venture to New England, however, did give him an exposure to Transcendentalism, which inspired him, like Harris, once again to head west--first to the back country of Warren County Missouri, where he expended his energy in a close study of German thought, particularly Hegel, and then, in 1856, to St. Louis.

It was there that Harris and Brokmeyer met in 1858 at the St. Louis Mercantile Library, where Harris was offering a public lecture. Brokmeyer convinced Harris of the significance of Hegel's system, and its relevance to the historical trends of American society. They immediately joined forces, attracting a number of other youthful followers with intellectual ambitions, many of whom were, like Harris, teachers in the public schools. The nascent Hegelian movement was temporarily stalled when Brokmeyer went off to serve as a Colonel in the Union Army during the Civil War, but it rebounded in full force upon his return with the formation of the St. Louis Philosophical Society in 1866, and the launching of the Journal of Speculative Philosophy, the official organ of the Society, in 1867.

Brokmeyer was the acknowledged intellectual leader of the movement. He published little, but his charismatic personality, quixotic meliorism, and extraordinary skills in argument and debate, consistently employed in the application of Hegelian dialectical logic, established his status as the framer of the ideals and aims of the movement. The manuscript of his translation of Hegel's Logic, although never published, became the theoretical text of the group, copied and distributed not only in St. Louis, but to sympathetic thinkers in other parts of the United States. Harris was, more than any other, the movement's public voice and organizing genius. He edited the Journal, contributing many of its articles himself. He also orchestrated a number of attempts to bring about a rapprochement between the western and New England idealists, first by inviting Alcott, Harris's former mentor, and Ralph Waldo Emerson to St. Louis, later by his participation in the formation of the Concord School of Philosophy, a summer school headed by Alcott that merged the two groups within its faculty. (Harris taught for all nine of the sessions of the Concord School's existence, from 1879 to 1887, and his disquisitions on Hegel became the most popular of the faculty's offerings.) But although these efforts furthered the influence of the St. Louisians, they were not, because of philosophical differences, wholly successful.

Even though Harris and Brokmeyer were first inspired to philosophical pursuits by the Transcendentalists, the thought of the St. Louis group was distinguished from the latter by its greater concentration on philosophical understanding guided by Hegelian method, without the literary and theological concerns of the New England movement, and a greater stress on social responsibility and reform. The emerging views of the various members of the group varied somewhat in details, but they shared a common conviction in the relevance of a Hegelian social philosophy, inspired mainly by Hegel's The Philosophy of Right and The Philosophy of History, to the problems and challenges facing the American society of their day, and the importance of education as a means of effecting necessary social change. Brokmeyer insisted on the necessity that thought issue in practical action directed to the social good, and the St. Louisians took this imperative to heart. The emphasis on education is evident in the pages of their journal, which were largely dedicated to the dissemination of European idealism, either through translations of Hegel and other German writers or summations of their work. They also shared a common enthusiasm for the prospects of their home city, divining by a clever but highly questionable use of the Hegelian dialectic what they believed to be historical forces that would propel St. Louis into an era of cultural supremacy in American society.

Gradually the group dissolved during the 1870s and 1880s as the core members of the group struck out on their own to pursue separate interests and aims. Characteristically, education and moral advancement were the themes of many of these individual pursuits. Denton Snider (1841-1925), a central figure within the movement who eventually became its historian, set upon a course of freelance teaching and lecturing as well as pursuing literary ambitions. In addition to offering lectures throughout the eastern and midwestern United States, including the Concord School, he founded or played a leading role in the operation of a number of visionary educational projects, such as the Communal University in Chicago and later St. Louis, the Chicago Kindergarten College, and the Goethe School in Milwaukee. Thomas Davidson (1840-1900), another key player in the original St. Louis movement, established the Breadwinner's College in New York City, a school devoted to the education of the working class, and later established a summer school at his home in Glenmore, New York.

The theme is echoed in the careers of the St. Louis movement's founders, Harris and Brokmeyer, during and after the dissipation of the movement itself. During his years as Superintendent of Schools in St. Louis, Harris was a strong proponent for the advancement of public education in Missouri. After his involvement at the Concord School he was appointed the United States Commissioner of Education in 1889. Brokmeyer entered the political arena in Missouri, and played a key role in the state's Constitutional Convention of 1875, which established a legal guarantee of education for all between the ages of six and twenty. Brokmeyer eventually served a term as Lieutenant Governor of the state, and acting Governor during 1876 and 1877, but when his political prospects turned against him, he returned to the wilderness life in numerous sojourns to the west. For a time he lived with the Creek Indians in Oklahoma. In 1896 he settled back in St. Louis, returning to a quiet life of scholarship and reflection until his death in 1906.

Despite the fact that the members of the group produced an extraordinary output of published writing, both in their journal and independently, the movement's ideas had little lasting influence on American philosophy, due in large part to the orthodoxy of their Hegelianism, which was soon overshadowed by the emerging naturalism of American thought during the first decades of the twentieth century. The one exception was George H. Howison (1834-1916), who came under the influence of the group while teaching mathematics at Washington University in St. Louis. Howison later settled in Berkeley, California, and developed a pluralistic form of idealism that survived as the twentieth century school of thought known as Personalism. The most significant contribution of the group to American thought was their journal, which offered a much needed vehicle for the publication of the early work of some of the most prominent figures of the next generation of American philosophy, such as John Dewey, William James, Charles Sanders Peirce, and Josiah Royce. In fact, Harris's encouragement when a young John Dewey timidly submitted his first philosophical essay for publication was crucial in the budding philosopher's decision to continue his studies. Although the ideas of the movement had little enduring influence, the St. Louis Hegelians represent an important chapter in the history of American philosophical thought and the developing relationship between intellectual and popular culture in the nineteenth century.

Suggestions for Further Reading

  • Elizabeth Flower and Murray G. Murphy, "The Absolute Immigrates to America: The St. Louis Hegelians" in A History of Philosophy in America, vol. 2 (New York: G. P. Putnam's Sons, 1977), pp. 463-514.
  • William H. Goetzmann, ed., The American Hegelians: An Intellectual Episode in the History of Western America (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • Frances A. Harmon, The Social Philosophy of the St. Louis Hegelians (New York: Columbia University Press, 1943).
  • Henry A. Pochmann, German Culture in America, Philosophical and Literary Influences, 1600-1900 (Madison, WS: University of Wisconsin Press, 1961).
  • Denton J. Snider, The St. Louis Movement in Philosophy, Literature, Education, Psychology, with Chapters of Autobiography (St. Louis: Sigma Publishing, 1920).

Author Information

Richard Field
Email: RFIELD(at)
Northwest Missouri State University
U. S. A.

The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Luce Irigaray (1932—)

Luce Irigaray is a prominent author in contemporary French feminism and Continental philosophy. She is an interdisciplinary thinker who works between philosophy, psychoanalysis, and linguistics. Originally a student of the famous analyst Jacques Lacan, Irigaray's departure from Lacan in Speculum of the Other Woman, where she critiques the exclusion of women from both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory, earned her recognition as a leading feminist theorist and continental philosopher. Her subsequent texts provide a comprehensive analysis and critique of the exclusion of women from the history of philosophy, psychoanalytic theory and structural linguistics. Irigaray alleges that women have been traditionally associated with matter and nature to the expense of a female subject position. While women can become subjects if they assimilate to male subjectivity, a separate subject position for women does not exist. Irigaray's goal is to uncover the absence of a female subject position, the relegation of all things feminine to nature/matter, and, ultimately, the absence of true sexual difference in Western culture. In addition to establishing this critique, Irigaray offers suggestions for altering the situation of women in Western culture. Mimesis, strategic essentialism, utopian ideals, and employing novel language, are but some of the methods central to changing contemporary culture. Irigaray's analysis of women's exclusion from culture and her use of strategic essentialism have been enormously influential in contemporary feminist theory. Her work has generated productive discussions about how to define femininity and sexual difference, whether strategic essentialism should be employed, and assessing the risk involved in engaging categories historically used to oppress women. Irigaray's work extends beyond theory into practice. Irigaray has been actively engaged in the feminist movement in Italy. She has participated in several initiatives in Italy to implement a respect for sexual difference on a cultural and, in her most recent work, governmental level. Her contributions to feminist theory and continental philosophy are many and her complete works present her readers with a rewarding challenge to traditional conceptions of gender, self, and body.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Irigaray's Project
  3. Influences
    1. Psychoanalysis
    2. Philosophy
  4. Major Themes
    1. Mimesis
    2. Novel Language and Utopian Ideals
    3. Mother/Daughter Relationships
    4. Language
    5. Ethics
    6. Politics
  5. Criticisms
    1. Strategic Essentialism
    2. Privileges Psychological Oppression
    3. Elides Differences
    4. Opaque Writing Style
    5. Exclusive Ethics
    6. Later Work
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. English Translations
    2. Suggested Further Reading

1. Biography

In a 1993 interview with Margaret Whitford, Luce Irigaray specifically says that she does not like to be asked personal questions. She does not want opinions about her everyday life to interfere with interpretations of her ideas. Irigaray believes that entrance into intellectual discussions is a hard won battle for women and that reference to biographical material is one way in which women's credibility is challenged. It is no surprise that detailed biographical information about Irigaray is limited and that different accounts conflict.

What remains constant between accounts is that Luce Irigaray was born in Belgium in 1932. She holds two doctoral degrees-one in Philosophy and the other in Linguistics. She is also a trained and practicing psychoanalyst. She has held a research post at the Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique de Paris since 1964. She is currently the Director of Research in Philosophy at the center, and also continues her private practice. Perhaps the most well known fact of Irigaray's life-which Irigaray herself refers to in the opening of je, tu, nous-is her education at, and later expulsion from, the Ecole Freudienne de Paris (Freudian School of Paris). The Ecole Freudienne was founded by the famous psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan. Irigaray trained at the school in the sixties. In 1974, she published the thesis she wrote while studying at the school, Speculum, de l'autre femme, translated into English as Speculum of the Other Woman. This thesis criticized-among philosophical topics-the phallocentrism of Freudian and Lacanian psychoanalysis. The publication of this thesis gained her recognition, but also negatively affected Irigaray's career. She was relieved of her teaching post at the University of Vincennes and was ostracized by the Lacanian community. In spite of these early hardships, Irigaray went on to become an influential and prolific author in contemporary feminist theory and continental philosophy. In addition to her intellectual accomplishments, Irigaray is committed to active participation in the women's movement in both France and internationally-especially in Italy. Several of her later texts are dedicated to her work in the women's movement of Italy. She is still actively researching and publishing.

2. Irigaray's Project

Irigaray argues that, since ancient times, mothers have been associated with nature and unthinking matter. Further, Irigaray believes that all women have historically been associated with the role of "mother" such that, whether or not a woman is a mother, her identity is always defined according to that role. This is in contrast to men who are associated with culture and subjectivity. While excluded from culture and subjectivity, women serve as their unacknowledged support. In other words, while women are not considered full subjects, society itself could not function without their contributions. Irigaray ultimately states that Western culture itself is founded upon a primary sacrifice of the mother, and all women through her.

Based on this analysis, Irigaray says that sexual difference does not exist. True sexual difference would require that men and women are equally able to achieve subjectivity. As is, Irigaray believes that men are subjects (e.g. self-conscious, self-same entities) and women are "the other" of these subjects (e.g. the non-subjective, supporting matter). Only one form of subjectivity exists in Western culture and it is male. While Irigaray is influenced by both psychoanalytic theory and philosophy, she identifies them both as influential discourses that exclude women from a social existence as mature subjects. In many of her texts, Irigaray seeks to unveil how both psychoanalytic theory and philosophy exclude women from a genuine social existence as autonomous subjects, and relegate women to the realm of inert, lifeless, inessential matter. With this critique in place, Irigaray suggests how women can begin to reconfigure their identity such that one sex does not exist at the expense of the other. However, she is unwilling to definitively state what that new identity should be like. Irigaray refrains from prescribing a new identity because she wants women to determine for themselves how they want to be defined. While both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory are her targets, Irigaray identifies philosophy as the master discourse. Irigaray's reasons for this designation are revealed in Speculum of the Other Woman where she demonstrates how philosophy-since Ancient times-has articulated fundamental epistemological, ontological, and metaphysical truths from a male perspective that excludes women. While she is not suggesting that philosophy is single-handedly responsible for the history of women's oppression, she wants to emphasize that the similar type of exclusion manifest in both philosophy and psychoanalysis predates the birth of psychoanalysis. As the companion discourse to philosophy, psychoanalysis plays a unique role. While Irigaray praises psychoanalysis for utilizing the method of analysis to reveal the plight of female subjectivity, she also thinks that it reinforces it. Freud attempts to explain female subjectivity and sexuality according to a male model. From this perspective, female subjectivity looks like a deformed or insufficiently developed form of male subjectivity. Irigaray argues that if Freud had turned the tools of analysis onto his own discourse, then he would have seen that female subjectivity cannot be understood through the lenses of a one-sex model. In other words, negative views of women exist because of theoretical bias-not because of nature. Through her critiques of both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory, Irigaray argues that women need to attain a social existence separate from the role of mother. However, this alone will not change the current state of affairs. For Irigaray is not suggesting that the social role of women will change if they merely step over the line of nature into culture. Irigaray believes that true social change will occur only if society challenges its perception of nature as unthinking matter to be dominated and controlled. Thus, while women must attain subjectivity, men must become more embodied. Irigaray argues that both men and women have to reconfigure their subjectivity so that they both understand themselves as belonging equally to nature and culture. Irigaray's discussions of mimesis, novel language and utopian ideals, reconfiguring the mother/daughter relationship, altering language itself, ethics, and politics are all central to achieving this end.

3. Influences

Irigaray's interdisciplinary interests in philosophy, psychoanalysis, and linguistics underscore that her work has more than one influence. Two main discourses that maintain a strong presence throughout her work are psychoanalysis, with Sigmund Freud and Jacques Lacan as its representatives, and philosophy. Insofar as Lacanian psychoanalysis works out of a background in structural linguistics, both Lacan and Irigaray also focus on language. Irigaray engages with philosophy, psychoanalysis and linguistics in order to uncover the lack of true sexual difference in Western culture.

a. Psychoanalysis

Irigaray states on the opening page of An Ethics of Sexual Difference that each age is defined by a philosophical issue that calls to be thoroughly examined-ours is sexual difference. Sexual difference is often associated with the anatomical differences between the sexes. However, Irigaray follows the French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan in understanding sexual difference as a difference that is assigned in language. While Irigaray is critical of Lacan, she is influenced by Lacan's interpretation of Freud's theory of subject formation.

Freud's work has served as a starting point for diverse psychoanalytic theories such as drive theory, object relations theory, and ego psychology. Lacan interprets Freud's work from a background in structural linguistics, philosophy, and, of course, psychoanalysis. Of particular importance to Irigaray's work is Lacan's claim that there are two key moments in the formation of a child's identity: the formation of an imaginary body and the assignation of sexual difference in language. Freud introduces the idea of an imaginary body in The Ego and the Id, in the section of the same name, when he describes the ego (self-consciousness) as neither strictly a psychic phenomenon nor a bodily phenomenon. Freud believes that an ego is formed in reference to a body, such that the manner in which an infant understands his or her selfhood is inseparable from his or her bodily existence. However, the body that an infant attributes to him or herself is not objectively understood-it is the mind's understanding of the body. This means that a person's understanding of his or her own body is imbued with a degree of fantasy and imagination. In his famous essay "The Mirror Stage as Formative of the I," Lacan expands Freud's comments on the bodily ego into a theory about imaginary anatomy. Lacan states that the first of two key moments in subject formation is the projection of an imaginary body. This occurs in the mirror stage at roughly six months. As a being who still lacks mobility and motor control, an infant who is placed in front of a mirror (another person can serve here as well, typically the mother) will identify with the unified, idealized image that is reflected back in the mirror. While the image in the mirror does not match the infant's experience, it is a key moment in the development of his or her ego. Rather than identify with him or herself as a helpless being, the child choose to identify with the idealized image of him or herself. Lacan believes that the element of fantasy and imagination involved in the identification with the mirror image marks the image as simultaneously representative and misrepresentative of the infant. While the body of the mirror stage is key to the infant's identity, it is also only an interpretation of his or her biological existence. In other words, according to Lacan, one's understanding of one's body occurs only in conjunction with an organization in language and image that begins in the mirror stage, and is further complicated by the next stage of ego formation-entrance into the Symbolic order. Irigaray agrees with Lacan that how we understand our biology is largely culturally influenced-thus does she accept the idea of an imaginary body. Irigaray employs the Lacanian imaginary body in her discussions about Western culture's bias against women. Irigaray argues that, like people, cultures project dominant imaginary schemes which then affect how that culture understands and defines itself. According to Irigaray, in Western culture, the imaginary body which dominates on a cultural level is a male body. Irigaray thus argues that Western culture privileges identity, unity, and sight-all of which she believes are associated with male anatomy. She believes that fields such as philosophy, psychoanalysis, science and medicine are controlled by this imaginary. Three examples from her work illustrate her view. In Speculum of the Other Woman, Irigaray addresses Freud's claim in his essay "Femininity" that little girls are only little men. She argues that Freud could not understand women because he was influenced by the one-sex theory of his time (men exist and women are a variation of men), and expanded his own, male experience of the world into a general theory applicable to all humans. According to Irigaray, since Freud was unable to imagine another perspective, his reduction of women to male experience resulted in viewing women as defective men. Another example is found in "Cosi Fan Tutti," (in This Sex Which Is Not One) where Irigaray argues that Lacan's ahistorical master signifier of the Symbolic order-the Phallus-is a projection of the male body. Irigaray argues that Lacan failed to diagnose the error of his predecessor, Freud, and similarly understood the world-and especially language-in terms of a one-sex model of sexuality and subjectivity. Although Lacan claims that the Phallus is not connected to male biology, his appropriation of Freud renders this claim false. A final example is found in "The Mechanics of 'Fluids'" (also in This Sex Which Is Not One) where Irigaray argues that science itself is biased towards categories typically personified as masculine (e.g. solids as opposed to fluids). Irigaray believes that if women are not understood in Western culture, it is because Western culture has yet to accept alternate paradigms for understanding them. While selfhood begins in the mirror stage with the imaginary body, it is not solidified until one enters the Symbolic order. According to Lacan, the Symbolic order is an ahistorical system of language that must be entered for a person to have a coherent social identity. The Phallus is the privileged master signifier of the Symbolic order. One must have a relationship to the Phallus if one is to attain social existence. According to Lacan, infants in the mirror stage do not differentiate between themselves and the world. For example, an infant views him or herself as continuous with his or her mother, and this understanding of the mother-child relationship organizes the infant's world. However, as the infant matures, he or she becomes aware that his or her mothers' attention is not wholly directed toward the infant in a reciprocal manner. The mother participates in a larger social context dominated by the Symbolic order. The infant fantasizes that if he or she could occupy the role of the Phallus-the master signifer of that Symbolic order-he or she could regain the full attention of the mother. However, this is impossible. In exchange for giving up this fantasy-which the Father demands of the child in the Oedipus complex-the infant gains his or her own relationship to the Phallus. The infant must break with the mother (nature, pre-symbolic) in order to become a subject (culture, symbolic order). One among many unique claims of Lacan's is that the infant acquires sexual difference in his or her relationship to the Phallus. According to Lacan, sexual difference is not about biological imperative (e.g. if you have a penis you are male, if you have a vagina you are female), it is about having one of two types of relationship to the Phallus-having or being the Phallus. Hence, in the Lacanian view, the body as humans understand it is something that is constructed in the mirror stage, and sexually differentiated in the entrance to the Symbolic order. Irigaray critically appropriates this radical description of sexual difference. She discusses the linguistic character of sexual difference in a manner similar to Lacan in This Sex Which Is Not One. Irigaray is more concerned with how culture-and language as a product of culture-understands sexual difference and subjectivity than with arguing that truths about sexual difference or subjectivity emerge out of biology itself. However she distances herself from Lacan in two key manners. First, Irigaray disagrees with Lacan's depiction of the Symbolic order as ahistorical and unchanging. Irigaray believes that language systems are malleable, and largely determined by power relationships that are in flux. Second, Irigaray remains unconvinced by Lacan's claims that the Phallus is an ahistorical master signifier of the Symbolic order that has no connection to male anatomy. In "Cosi Fan Tutti," she argues that the Phallus is not a purely symbolic category, but is ultimately an extension of-and reinforcement of-Freud's description of the world according to a one-sex model. According to Irigaray, the Phallus as the master signifier (that can be traced back to male anatomy) is evidence that the Symbolic order is constructed and not ahistorical.

b. Philosophy

Irigaray is also influenced by her extensive study of the history of philosophy. Texts such as Speculum of the Other Woman and An Ethics of Sexual Difference demonstrate her command of the philosophical canon. Speculum of the Other Woman discusses the elision of all things feminine in traditional thinkers such as Aristotle, Descartes, Kant, and Hegel. An Ethics of Sexual Difference also discusses the elision of the feminine, but specifically from the perspective of ethical relationships between men and women. An Ethics of Sexual Difference addresses thinkers as diverse as Plato, Merleau-Ponty, Spinoza, and Levinas. Irigaray is also writing a series of texts devoted to the four elements. The elemental works Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche and The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger are sustained discussions of the exclusions implemented by key male philosophers.

No one philosopher can be identified as influencing Irigaray. She appropriates from various thinkers while maintaining a critical distance. For example, her method of mimesis resembles Derridian deconstruction. However, she also criticizes Derrida's deconstruction of the category "woman" (see Derrida's Spurs) in Marine Lover. As another example, she agrees with Heidegger that every age has a concept that underlies and informs its beliefs, but is radically unknown to it. For Heidegger it was "Being," for Irigaray it is "sexual difference." Like Heidegger, she wants to investigate the concept that Western culture takes to be self-evident in order to show that it is unknown to us. However she is critical in The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger of Heidegger's exclusion of women. One can also find Levinasian (An Ethics of Sexual Difference), Hegelian (I love to you) or Marxist (This Sex Which Is Not One, "Women on the Market") undertones in Irigaray's discussions of ethics and dialectical thinking. While she is clearly influenced by the history of philosophy, her own project of creating a new space for redefining women does not permit her to privilege any one philosophical approach.

4. Major Themes

a. Mimesis

Irigaray describes herself as analyzing both the analysts and the philosophers. Perhaps the most famous critical tool employed by Irigaray is mimesis. Mimesis is a process of resubmitting women to stereotypical views of women in order to call the views themselves into question. Key to mimesis is that the stereotypical views are not repeated faithfully. One example is that if women are viewed as illogical, women should speak logically about this view. According to Irigaray, the juxtaposition of illogical and logical undermines the claim that women are illogical. Or if women's bodies are viewed as multiple and dispersed, women should speak from that position in a playful way that suggests that this view stems from a masculine economy that values identity and unity (e.g. the penis or the Phallus) and excludes women as the other (e.g. lack, dispersed, or "nothing to see"). This type of mimesis is also known as strategic essentialism. Irigaray's essay "This Sex Which Is Not One," in the text of the same name, provides several clear examples of this method.

According to Irigaray, the very possibility of repeating a negative view unfaithfully suggests that women are something other than the view expressed. Irigaray repeats the views because she believes that overcoming harmful views of women cannot occur through simply ignoring the views. True to the methodology of psychoanalysis, she believes that negative views can only be overcome when they are exposed and demystified. When successfully employed, mimesis repeats a negative view-without reducing women to that view-and makes fun of it such that the view itself must be discarded. Irigaray's wager in utilizing mimesis with regard to female subjectivity is as follows. Male dominance has defined Western culture for centuries. If a new form of subjectivity comes into being out of the death of the modern, transcendental subject, and we have never really investigated or mimetically engaged with the deformed, female form of subjectivity that accompanied and sustained the male form, then what would prevent the logic of master/subject/male and slave/other/female from repeating itself? According to Irigaray, the logic will not be altered until we call attention to the fact that subjectivity has changed before when male dominance has not. We must ask after the feminine other. Irigaray believes that only by asking after the other through mimesis will it be possible to affect a paradigm shift. Irigaray therefore speaks from the silenced position of women in order to (a) challenge the authority of either the negative view or the repression by revealing that position to be nothing more than a fabrication (b) show how the woman/body has been excluded by either revealing the stereotypical view to be false or by inciting the excluded woman/body to speak and (c) thereby force a shift in the conception of female subjectivity and the body. Irigaray employs mimesis because she believes that a 'second sex' cannot exist in its own right (or with a positive form of identity as opposed to being viewed as a deformed version of male identity) until we have not only challenged, but also passed back through the oppressive formulation of sexual difference in contemporary Western culture.

b. Novel Language and Utopian Ideals

While the goal of mimesis is to problematize the male definition of femininity to such a degree that a new definition of and, ultimately, an embodied subject position for women can emerge, Irigaray says in her earlier work that she will not prescribe in advance either the definition or the subject position. In This Sex Which Is Not One, Irigaray clearly indicates that she will not redefine femininity because it would interfere with women redefining themselves for themselves. Further, she believes that she cannot describe the feminine (e.g. female subjectivity, the female imaginary body) outside of the current, male definitions without further disrupting the male definitions of women. A new definition for women has to emerge out of a mimetic engagement with the old definitions, and it is a collective process.

Irigaray is, however, willing to provide material to help ignite the process of redefinition. The material she offers varies from new concepts about religion and bodies-expressed through both the novel use of existing words and the creation of new words-to utopian ideals. One example of a new concept that she puts into play through novel language is her discussion of the sensible/transcendental and female divinity. Irigaray introduces these concepts in order to disrupt male dominance in religion. Irigaray follows Feuerbach in interpreting the divine as an organizing principle for both identity and culture. Religion is thus viewed as caught up in power and culture. Irigaray specifically targets male dominated religions that posit a transcendental God. She believes that these religions reinforce male dominance and the division of the world into male/subject and female/body. She suggests that in place of a religion that focuses on a transcendent God, we construct a divinity that is both sensible and transcendental. In other words, given the connection between religion and culture, and the manner in which the mind/body split has fallen out along gender lines, why not propose a vision of divinity that will help Western culture overcome its dualisms and prejudices about those dualisms. Irigaray is not prescribing the sensible/transcendental as a new religion to be implemented and followed, but merely placing it in circulation as a creative impetus for change. An example of utopian ideals can be found in Sexes and Genealogies, thinking the difference, and je, tu, nous. In these texts, Irigaray describes civil laws that she believes would help women achieve social existence (mature subjectivity) in Western culture. In one law she suggests that virginity needs to be protected under the law so that women have control over their own sexuality. She also describes new ways in which the mother/daughter relationship should be legally protected, and outlines how mothers and daughters can communicate with each other so that female subjectivity can be further developed. When these texts were first published, these views were widely interpreted as suggestions intended to initiate discussions between women (utopian ideals) and not as prescriptions for social change. While Irigaray's later work has complicated this interpretation, it is still widely accepted.

c. Mother/Daughter Relationships

According to Irigaray, while it is necessary to alter cultural norms, it is equally as important to address the problematic nature of individual relationships between women-especially the mother/daughter relationship. To emphasize how mother/daughter relationships are sundered in contemporary Western culture, Irigaray turns to Greek mythology. For example, she discusses the myth of Demeter, the goddess of the earth (agriculture), and her daughter Persephone. In the myth, Zeus, Persephone's father, aids his brother Hades, king of the underworld, to abduct the young Perspephone. Hades has fallen in love with Persephone and wants her to be queen of the underworld. When Demeter learns that her daughter is missing, she is devastated and abandons her role as goddess of the earth. The earth becomes barren. To reestablish harmony in the world, Zeus needs Demeter to return to her divine responsibilities. Zeus orders Hades to return Persephone. However, Persephone is tricked into eating a pomegranate seed that binds her to Hades forever. Under the persuasion of Zeus, Hades agrees to release Persephone from the underworld for half of each year. Irigaray reads this myth as an example of both a positive mother/daughter relationship, and the success of men at breaking it apart. Demeter and Persephone love each other and Demeter strives to protect her daughter. However, in this myth they are ultimately at the mercy of the more powerful males. The myth is also an example of men exchanging women as if they were commodities. Zeus conspires with his brother and, in effect, gives his daughter away without consulting either Persephone or Demeter. Irigaray believes that myths tell us something about the deterioration of the mother/daughter relationship and the manner in which men have traditionally controlled the fate of women-whether they are wives, daughters, sisters, or mothers. Irigaray utilizes myth to suggest that mothers and daughters need to protect their relationships and strengthen their bonds to one another.

The need to alter the mother/daughter relationship is a constant theme in Irigaray's work. While she believes that women's social and political situation has to be addressed on a global level, she also thinks that change begins in individual relationships between women. Thus she stresses the need for mothers to represent themselves differently to their daughters, and to emphasize their daughter's subjectivity. For example, in je, tu, nous, Irigaray offers suggestions for developing mother-daughter relationships such as displaying images of the mother-daughter couple, or consciously emphasizing that the daughter and the mother are both subjects in their own right. Changing relationships between mothers and daughters also requires language work.

d. Language

Since Irigaray agrees with Lacan that one must enter language (culture) in order to be a subject, she believes that language itself must change if women are to have their own subjectivity that is recognized at a cultural level. She believes that language typically excludes women from an active subject position. Further, inclusion of women in the current form of subjectivity is not the solution. Irigaray's goal is for there to be more than one subject position in language.

In order to prove that language excludes women from subjectivity, Irigaray conducted research that links the exclusion of women from subjectivity in Western culture to the speech patterns of men and women. She concluded that general speech patterns specific to each sex do exist and that women often do not occupy the subject position in language. She argues that in language experiments, women were less willing to occupy the subject position. Referring to the French language as a clear example-even though she believes that the structure of the English language does not exempt it from sexism-she discusses the dominance of the masculine in both the plural and the neuter, which takes the same form as the masculine. Irigaray argues that objects of value, such as the sun or God, are typically marked with the masculine gender while less important objects are feminine. Since language and society mutually affect each other, Irigaray believes that language must change along with society. Failure to see the importance of changing language is an impediment to real change. According to Irigaray, it is crucial that women learn to occupy the position of "I" and "you" in language. Irigaray views the "I" and the "you" as markers of subjectivity. In her text I love to you, Irigaray describes how she determined that women do not occupy the subject position. She conducted an experiment where she gave her subjects a noun (e.g. enfant) and asked her test subjects to use the noun in a sentence as a pronoun (il or elle). The majority of both men and women consistently chose "il". She noted in another experiment, where she gave a sequence that implied the use of "elle" (e.g. robe-se-voir), that both sexes avoided using "elle" (she) and "elle se" (she herself) as an active subject. In contrast, when she gave a sequence that implied the use of il as a subject, it was almost always used. Further, Irigaray discovered that young girls seek an intersubjective dialogue with their mothers, but that their mothers did not reciprocate. Irigaray concludes from her research that women are not subjects in language in the same way as men. She believes that men and women do not produce the same sentences with similar cues, they use prepositions differently, and they represent temporality in language differently. Irigaray seeks for men and women to recognize each other in language as irreducible others. She argues that this cannot happen until women occupy the subject position, and men learn to communicate with other subjects. Irigaray believes that a language of 'indirection' could help bring this to fruition. She describes this in her book I love to you. The title itself is an example of this language of indirection. Saying "I love to you" rather than "I love you" is a way of symbolizing a respect for the other. The "to" is a verbal barrier against appropriating or subjugating the other. Speaking differently in this manner is an integral part of Irigaray's general project to cultivate true intersubjectivity between the genders. However, she does not put forth a definitive plan for implementing this change in language.

e. Ethics

While ethics is a constant theme throughout her work, Irigaray's text An Ethics of Sexual Difference is devoted to this theme. In this text, Irigaray intertwines essays of her own on the ethics of sexual difference with dialogues that she has created between herself and six male philosophers: Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Spinoza, Merleau-Ponty and Levinas. Irigaray groups the dialogues into four sections that each begin with an essay of her own about sexual difference and love. Her own essay signals what themes she will address with regard to each of the philosophers she discusses. Irigaray utilizes her analyses of the male philosophers to discuss the following themes which are essential to her ethics: creative relationships between men and women that are not based in reproduction, separate 'places' for men and women (emotional and embodied), wonder at the difference of the other, acknowledgement of finiteness and intersubjectivity, and an embodied divinity.

In the first section, which engages Plato and Aristotle, Irigaray emphasizes that an ethical love relationship must be creative independent of procreation, and that both men and women need to have a place for themselves (be embodied individuals) that is open to, but not subsumable by, the other. In the second section, using Descartes and Spinoza, she argues that ethical love cannot occur between men and women until there is respect and wonder for the irreducible difference of the other, and an admittance and acceptance of one's finiteness. In the third section, in which there is no engagement with a male philosopher, Irigaray describes how the infinite is essential to love between men and women. She believes that it is unethical that women have not had access to subjectivity, and that the universals of our culture have been dominated by a male imaginary. She says that ethics requires that men and women understand themselves as embodied subjects. In the fourth and final section, Irigaray discusses Merleau-Ponty and Levinas. She argues that if ethical relationships are to occur between men and women, men must overcome nostalgia for the womb. Thus will they develop their identity, and open up a space for women to create their own. Further, Irigaray believes that we must think both otherness and divinity in conjunction with embodiment. She believes that separating mind and body is unethical insofar as it perpetuates the division in culture between man/mind and woman/body. Ethics involves thinking of otherness and divinity in terms of the sensible/transcendental. At the end of her An Ethics of Sexual Difference, it is clear that Irigaray does not believe that Western culture is ethical, and that the primary reason is its treatment of women and nature. She believes that nothing short of altering our views of subjectivity, science, and religion can change this situation. Men and women must work together to learn to respect the irreducible difference between them. Women must become full subjects, and men must recognize that they are embodied. Further, ethical love relationships are based in respect for alterity and creativity outside of reproduction. Her text I love to you, which focuses on both language and ethics, is a clear example of how her discussion of ethics can also be developed from a Hegelian perspective.

f. Politics

Irigaray refuses to belong to any one group in the feminist movement because she believes that there is a tendency for groups to set themselves up against each other. When groups within the women's movement fight each other, this detracts from the overall goal of trying to positively alter the social, political, and symbolic position of women. Irigaray models solidarity among women in her unwillingness to belong exclusively to one group.

Irigaray is particularly active in the feminist movement in Italy. Texts such as I love to you, Democracy Begins Between Two, and Two Be Two were all inspired by and, at various moments, give accounts of Irigaray's experience with the Italian women's movement. An example of Irigaray's most recent collaborations with Italy, and a testimony to her commitment to her ideas, is her collaboration with the Commission for Equal Opportunities for the region of Emilia-Romagna. She was invited by this region to educate its citizens about her political ideals. Her text, Democracy Begins Between Two, was a part of that collaboration insofar as it was the theoretical work behind her role as adviser. In that text she also describes how she and Renzo Imbeni co-authored a "Report on Citizenship of the Union." This report argued for rights based on sexual difference and was submitted to the European Parliament for ratification.

5. Criticisms

a. Strategic Essentialism

Irigaray's use of strategic essentialism has been criticized as essentialism itself-or of endorsing the belief that social behavior follows from biology. The appearance of her translated work in the United States was met with great opposition. She was read as further naturalizing women at a time when women were benefiting both politically and socially from arguing that biology did not matter. Irigaray and her supporters defended her engagement with essentialist views as a strategy. They argued that when Irigaray seeks to alter the exclusion of the feminine by repeating or reiterating naturalizing discourses about female bodies, she is not suggesting a return to a lost female body that pre-exists patriarchy. Rather, she is employing her strategy of mimesis. While many contemporary interpreters now accept this view, strategic essentialism remains a controversial aspect of Irigaray's work.

b. Privileges Psychological Oppression

Irigaray has been criticized-especially by materialist feminists-on the grounds that she privileges questions of psychological oppression over social/material oppression. The concern is that the psychoanalytic discourse that Irigaray relies upon-even though she is critical of it-universalizes and abstracts away from material conditions that are of central concern to feminism. Materialist feminists do not believe that definitive changes in the structure of politics can result from the changes Irigaray proposes in psychoanalytic theories of subject formation. However, Irigaray's goal to challenge psychoanalytic theory and to change the definition of femininity evinces an agreement with the materialist position. Both agree that the ahistorical, overly universalized character of traditional psychoanalytic theory must be rejected. Further, Irigaray argues that focusing on language work and on altering allegedly intractable structures does not mean that women have to ignore material conditions. In This Sex Which Is Not One, Irigaray says that simultaneous with her challenges to the symbolic order, women must fight for equal wages, and against discrimination in employment and education. Irigaray recognizes that it is important to find ways to challenge the social and economic position in which women find themselves. But focusing exclusively on women's material or economic situation as the key to change will only-at best-grant women access to a male social role insofar as it will not change the definition of women. Irigaray's response to first changing material conditions would be that it would leave the question of a non-patriarchal view of female identity untouched. Due to the force of the oppression of women, it is the definitions that have to be changed before women, as distinct from men, will attain a social existence.

c. Elides Differences

Related to the materialist critique is the question of whether or not Irigaray's psychoanalytic approach can account for real differences between women. Irigaray often discusses a subject position for women and a new definition of women. A common question asked of Irigaray is whether or not a universal definition for women is desirable considering the real differences between women. More specifically, if Irigaray insists on a universal subject position for women, will it be exclusively determined by first world, white, middle class women? Can her universal successfully include the experiences of minority women, second and third world women, and economically disadvantaged women? Or does it create further exclusion among the excluded themselves? Irigaray's interpreters remain divided on this question.

d. Opaque Writing Style

Irigaray is often criticized along with other French feminists, such as Julia Kristeva, for the opacity of her writing style. Based on her writing style, she has been dismissed as elitist. Irigaray's writing is undeniably challenging and complex. But, the difficulty of her work can be equally productive as it is labor intensive. Irigaray's opacity can be viewed as fruitful when understood in conjunction with one mode of writing that she assumes-that of an analyst. In this style of writing, Irigaray not only will not assume the position of a master-knower who imparts knowledge in a linear manner, she also considers her readers' reactions to her work to be an integral part of that work. Her alleged failure to be clear, or to give a concrete, linear feminist theory, are invitations for readers to imagine their own vision for the future. Like the psychoanalytic session, her texts are a collaboration between writer (analyst) and reader (analysand). Irigaray believes that, through writing in this style, she can take culture as a whole as her analysand.

e. Exclusive Ethics

Irigaray's view of ethics is criticized because she describes the quintessential ethical relationship using a man and a woman. The question arises of whether or not Irigaray is suggesting that the heterosexual couple is the model for ethical relationships. Since it is unclear whether or not Irigaray's view can be applied to other types of relationships (e.g. same sex friendships or same sex love relationships), this point of criticism remains unresolved. Related to this critique is a concern that Irigaray's emphasis on sexual difference and male/female relationships also prevent her from accounting for non-traditional family arrangements.

f. Later Work

Irigaray's most recent work raises the final point of controversy. In her earlier work, Irigaray refuses to give a new definition of women because she thinks that women must give it to themselves. However, in her most recent work she has developed laws that she submitted to the European Parliament for ratification. Irigaray's interpreters debate about the relationship between her early work and her most recent texts. Is there continuity between the early and the later position? Or has Irigaray abandoned her earlier project? A spectrum of interpretations are available with no final answer.

6. References and Further Reading

a. English Translations

  • Irigaray, Luce. An Ethics of Sexual Difference. Trans. Carolyn Burke and Gillian C. Gill. Ithaca: Cornell UP, 1993.
    • Mimetic engagement with Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Spinoza, Merleau-Ponty, and Levinas on the question of ethics. Irigaray elaborates here her own vision for ethical relationships.
  • Between East and West: From Singularity to Community. Trans. Stephen Pluhácek. New York: Columbia UP, 2002.
    • Draws on Eastern philosophy and meditative techniques such as yoga to suggest new approaches to the question of sexual difference.
  • Democracy Begins Between Two. Trans. Kirsteen Anderson. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Inspired by a partnership with the Commission for Equal Opportunities for the region of Emilia-Romagna in Italy, this text describes civil rights for women that would grant them an equal social position to men. This text also includes the Report on Citizenship of the Union by Renzo Imbeni. This report was written in collaboration with Irigaray and submitted to the European Parliament for ratification.
  • Elemental Passions. Trans. Joanne Collie and Judith Still. New York: Routledge, 1992.
    • One text in Irigaray's series of elemental works. Addresses the relationship between men and women within the context of the elements and the senses.
  • je, tu, nous: towards a culture of difference. Trans. Alison Martin. New York: Routledge, 1993.
    • A series of essays that address diverse issues such as civil rights for women and prejudices in biology about the mother-fetus relationship.
  • I love to you: sketch of a possible felicity in history. Trans. Alison Martin. New York: Routledge, 1996.
    • Strategic engagement with Hegel in which Irigaray appropriates his use of dialectic in order to describe how men and women are both individuals and members of their gender. Also includes an extensive discussion of the language of indirection that Irigaray believes facilitates ethical relationships between men and women.
  • The Irigaray Reader. Ed. Margaret Whitford. Cambridge: Blackwell, 1991.
    • Useful compilation of essays, some of which are found in the texts listed here.
  • Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. New York: Columbia University Press, 1991.
    • One text in Irigaray's elemental series, this text is a strategic engagement with Nietzsche and Derrida on the elision of femininity.
  • Sexes and Genealogies. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. New York: Columbia University Press, 1993.
    • Compilation of essays that address themes as diverse as how to alter the psychoanalytic session to descriptions of the sensible/transcendental.
  • Speculum of the Other Woman. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1985.
    • Irigaray's doctoral dissertation. This text is a complex engagement with the history of philosophy and psychoanalytic theory.
  • The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger. Trans. Mary Beth Mader. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1999.
    • One text in Irigaray's elemental series. This text is a strategic engagement with the philosopher Martin Heidegger.
  • Thinking the Difference: For a Peaceful Revolution. Trans. Karin Montin. New York: Routledge, 1994.
    • Compilation of essays on diverse themes. Similar in structure to je, tu, nous.
  • This Sex Which Is Not One. Trans. Catherine Porter. New York: Cornell University Press, 1985.
    • Compilation of essays that discuss themes as diverse as where Lacanian theory went wrong, what mimesis is, and how to give a Marxist critique of the exchange of women in Western culture.
  • To Be Two. Trans. Monique M. Rhodes and Marco F. Cocito-Monoc. New York: Routledge, 2001.
    • Later work. Further exploration of the question of difference and alterity.
  • To Speak Is Never Neutral. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Sustained discussion of language. Studying the language of both mentally ill and normal subjects, Irigaray argues that language is never deployed in a completely neutral manner.
  • Why Different?. Trans. Camille Collins. Ed. Luce Irigaray and Sylvere Lotinger. New York: Semiotext(e) Foreign Agent Series, 2000.
    • A compilation of interviews with Irigaray about select work written in the 80's and 90's such as Sexes and Genealogies and Language is Never Neutral.

b. Suggested Further Reading

  • Chanter, Tina. Ethics of Eros: Irigaray's Re-Writing of the Philosophers. New York: Routledge, 1995.
    • Thoroughly discusses philosophical influences on Irigaray's work. Argues that comprehending the philosophical influences on Irigaray highlights her innovative ideas about the now passe sex/gender distinction.
  • Cheah, Pheng and Elizabeth Grosz. "The Future of Sexual Difference: An Interview with Judith Butler and Drucilla Cornell." Diacritics, no. 28.1 (1998): 19-41.
    • Highlights central disagreements between prominent feminist thinkers about Irigaray's work.
  • Freud, Sigmund. Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud. Trans. James Strachey in collaboration with Anna Freud. 24 vols. London: Hogarth Press and the Institute of Psychoanalysis, 1953-1974.
  • Freud, Sigmund. The Freud Reader. Ed. Peter Gay. NewYork: W.W. Norton & Co., 1989.
    • Accessible compilation of Freud's work. Of particular interest are "The Ego and the Id," "Femininity," "Mourning and Melancholia," and "Three Essays On The Theory of Sexuality." For unabridged versions of texts, consult the standard edition listed above.
  • Fuss, Diana. Essentially Speaking: Feminism, Nature and Difference. New York: Routledge, 1989.
    • Interesting discussion of strategic essentialism. Includes a discussion of Irigaray, pp. 55-72.
  • Gatens, Moira. Imaginary Bodies: Ethics, Power, and Corporeality. New York: Routledge, 1996.
    • Useful discussion of how the imaginary body plays out at a cultural level.
  • Grosz, Elizabeth. Volatile Bodies: Towards a Corporeal Feminism. Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1994.
    • A central text in philosophy of the body and the overcoming of dualisms.
  • Lacan, Jacques. Ecrits. Trans. Alan Sheridan. New York: W.W. Nortion & Co., 1977.
    • An accessible compilation of key essays in Lacanian thought.
  • Feminine Sexuality. Ed. Mitchell, Juliet and Jacqueline Rose. Trans. Jaqueline Rose. New York: W.W. Norton & Co., 1985.
    • An accessible compilation of key essays by Lacan on feminine sexuality.
  • Lorraine, Tamsin. Irigaray and Deleuze: Experiments in Visceral Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999.
    • Very clear description of difficult aspects of Irigaray's thought. Interesting thesis about connections with Deleuze and Guatarri.
  • Schor, Naomi. "This Essentialism Which is Not One." Ed. Burke, Carolyn, Naomi Schor, and Margaret Whitford. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
    • Very famous and useful discussion of the different kinds of essentialism.
  • Whitford, Margaret. Luce Irigaray: Philosophy in the Feminine. New York: Routledge, 1991.
    • Whitford writes about the psychoanalytic influence on Irigaray's work. Whitford fleshes out Irigaray's appropriation of key psychoanalytic themes and clearly explains complex aspects of Irigaray's work.

Author Information

Sarah K. Donovan
Villanova University
U. S. A.

Ismaili Philosophy

Ismailism belongs to the Shi‘a main stream of Islam. Recent scholarship, based on a more judicious analysis of primary sources, has shown how Ismaili thought was in constant interaction with and to a certain extent influenced well-known currents of Islamic philosophy, theology, and mysticism.

Shi‘i and Ismaili philosophy use ta’wil as a tool of interpretation of scripture. This Qur’anic term connotes going back to the original meaning of the Qur’an. The objective of Ismaili thought is to create a bridge between Hellenic philosophy and religion. The human intellect is engaged to retrieve and disclose that which is interior or hidden (batin).

Ismailism presents a cosmology within an adapted Neoplatonic framework but tries to create an alternative synthesis. The starting point of such a synthesis is the doctrine of ibda‘ (derived from Qur’an 2:117). In its verbal form it is taken to mean 'eternal existentiation' to explain the notion in the Qur’an of God’s timeless command (Kun: ‘Be!’). The process of creation can be said to take place at several levels. Ibda‘ represents the initial level. The human intellect eventually relates to creation and tries to penetrate the mystery of the unknowable God.

Human history operates cyclically. The function of the Prophet is to reveal the religious law (shari‘a) while the Imam unveils gradually to his disciples the inner meaning (batin) of the revelation through the ta’wil.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Language and Meaning: The Stance of Ismaili Philosophy
  3. Manifesting Transcendence: Knowledge of the Cosmos

1. Introduction

Ismailism belongs to the Shi‘a branch of Islam, and, in common with various Muslim interpretive communities, has been concerned with developing a philosophical discourse to elucidate foundational Qur’anic and Islamic beliefs and principles. It would, however, be misleading to label Ismaili and other Muslim philosophical stances, as has been done by some scholars in the past, simplistically as manifestations of "Ismaili/Muslim Neoplatonism," and "Ismaili/Muslim gnosticism," and so forth. While elements of these philosophical and spiritual schools were certainly appropriated, and common features may be evident in the expression and development of Ismaili as well as other ideas, it must be noted that they were applied within very different historical and intellectual contexts and that such ideas came to be quite dramatically transformed in their meaning, purpose and significance in Islamic philosophy.

By those who were hostile to it or opposed its philosophical and intellectual stance, the Ismailis were regarded as heretical; legends were fabricated about them and their teachings. Early Western scholarship on Islamic philosophy inherited some of the biases of some medieval Muslim anti-philosophical stances, which tended to project a negative image of Ismailism, perceiving its philosophical contribution as having been derived from sources and tendencies 'alien' to Islam. Recent scholarship, based on a more judicious analysis of primary sources, provides a balanced perspective, and has shown how Ismaili thought was in constant interaction with and to a certain extent influenced well-known currents of Islamic philosophy and theology. Their views represent a consensus that it is inappropriate to treat Ismailism as a marginal school of Islamic thought; rather it constitutes a significant philosophical branch, among others, in Islamic philosophy.

Early Ismaili philosophy works dating back to the Fatimid period (fourth/tenth to sixth/twelfth century) are in Arabic; Nasir Khusraw (d. 471/1078) was the only Ismaili writer of the period to write in Persian. The Arabic tradition was continued in Yemen and India by the Musta‘li branch and in Syria by the Nizaris. In Persia and in Central Asia, the tradition was preserved and elaborated in Persian. Elsewhere among the Ismailis, local oral languages and literatures played an important part, though no strictly philosophical writings were developed in these languages.

2. Language and Meaning: The Stance of Ismaili Philosophy

Among the tools of interpretation of scripture that are associated particularly with Shi‘i and Ismaili philosophy is that of ta’wil. The application of this Qur’anic term, which connotes "going back to the first/the beginning," marks the effort in Ismaili thought of creating a philosophical and hermeneutical discourse that establishes the intellectual discipline for approaching revelation and creates a bridge between philosophy and religion.

Philosophy as conceived in Ismaili thought thus seeks to extend the meaning of religion and revelation to identify the visible and the apparent (zahir) and also to penetrate to the roots, to retrieve and disclose that which is interior or hidden (batin). Ultimately, this discovery engages both the intellect (‘aql) and the spirit (ruh), functioning in an integral manner to illuminate and disclose truths (haqa’iq).

The appropriate mode of language which serves us best in this task is, according to Ismaili philosophers, symbolic language. Such language, which employs analogy, metaphor and symbols, allows one to make distinctions and to establish differences in ways that a literal reading of language does not permit. Such language employs a special system of signs, the ultimate meaning of which can be 'unveiled' by the proper application of hermeneutics (ta’wil).

3. Manifesting Transcendence: Knowledge of the Cosmos

It has been argued that Ismaili cosmology, integrates a manifestational cosmology (analogous to some aspects of Stoic thought) within an adapted Neoplatonic framework to create an alternative synthesis. The starting point of such a synthesis is the doctrine of ibda (derived from Qur’an 2:117). In its verbal form it is taken to mean 'eternal existentiation' to explain the notion in the Qur’an of God’s timeless command (Kun: Be!). Ibda therefore connotes not a specific act of creation but the dialogical mode through which a relationship between God and His creation can be affirmed - it articulates the process of beginning and sets the stage for developing a philosophy of the manifestation of transcendence in creation.

In sum the process of creation can be said to take place at several levels. Ibda represents the initial level - one transcends history, the other creates it. The spiritual and material realms are not dichotomous, since in the Ismaili formulation, matter and spirit are united under a higher genus and each realm possesses its own hierarchy. Though they require linguistic and rational categories for definition, they represent elements of a whole, and a true understanding of God must also take account of His creation. Such a synthesis is crucial to how the human intellect eventually relates to creation and how it ultimately becomes the instrument for penetrating through history the mystery of the unknowable God implied in the formulation of tawhid.

Human history, as conceived in Ismailism, operates cyclically. According to this typological view, the epoch of the great prophets mirrors the cosmological paradigm, unfolding to recover the equilibrium and harmony inherent in the divine pattern of creation. Prophets and, after them, their appointed successors, the imams, have as their collective goal the establishment of a just society. The function of the Prophet is to initiate the cycle for human society and of the Imam to complement and interpret the teaching to sustain the just order at the social and individual levels.

As Nasir Khusraw, the best known of the Ismaili writers in Persian, states in a passage paraphrased by Corbin:

Time is eternity measured by the movements of the heavens,
whose name is day, night, month, year. Eternity is Time not
measured, having neither beginning nor end…The cause of Time
is the Soul of the World….; it is not in time, for time is
in the horizon of the soul as its instrument, as the duration
of the living mortal who is "the shadow of the soul", while
eternity is the duration of the living immortal - that is to
say of the Intelligence and of the Soul.

This synthesis of time as cycle and time as arrow lies at the heart of an Ismaili philosophy of active engagement in the world.

Author Information

Azim Nanji
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Jain Philosophy

Jain_handJainism is properly the name of one of the religious traditions that have their origin in the Indian subcontinent. According to its own traditions, the teachings of Jainism are eternal, and hence have no founder; however, the Jainism of this age can be traced back to Mahavira, a teacher of the sixth century BCE, a contemporary of the Buddha. Like those of the Buddha, Mahavira’s doctrines were formulated as a reaction to and rejection of the Brahmanism (religion based on the Hindu scriptures, the Vedas and Upanisads) then taking shape. The brahmans taught the division of society into rigidly delineated castes, and a doctrine of reincarnation guided by karma, or merit brought about by the moral qualities of actions. Their schools of thought, since they respected the authority of the Vedas and Upanisads, were known as orthodox darsanas ('darsanas' means literally, ‘views’). Jainism and Buddhism, along with a school of materialists called Carvaka, were regarded as the unorthodox darsanas, because they taught that the Vedas and Upanisads, and hence the brahman caste, had no authority.

Table of Contents

  1. Metaphysics
  2. Epistemology and Logic
  3. Ethics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Metaphysics

According to Jain thought, the basic constituents of reality are souls (jiva), matter (pudgala), motion (dharma), rest (adharma), space (akasa), and time (kala). Space is understood to be infinite in all directions, but not all of space is inhabitable. A finite region of space, usually described as taking the shape of a standing man with arms akimbo, is the only region of space that can contain anything. This is so because it is the only region of space that is pervaded with dharma, the principle of motion (adharma is not simply the absence of dharma, but rather a principle that causes objects to stop moving). The physical world resides in the narrow part of the middle of inhabitable space. The rest of the inhabitable universe may contain gods or other spirits.

While Jainism is dualistic—that is, matter and souls are thought to be entirely different types of substance—it is frequently said to be atheistic. What is denied is a creator god above all. The universe is eternal, matter and souls being equally uncreated. The universe contains gods who may be worshipped for various reasons, but there is no being outside it exercising control over it. The gods and other superhuman beings are all just as subject to karma and rebirth as human beings are. By their actions, souls accumulate karma, which is understood to be a kind of matter, and that accumulation draws them back into a body after death. Hence, all souls have undergone an infinite number of previous lives, and—with the exception of those who win release from the bondage of karma—will continue to reincarnate, each new life determined by the kind and amount of karma accumulated. Release is achieved by purging the soul of all karma, good and bad.

Every living thing has a soul, so every living thing can be harmed or helped. For purposes of assessing the worth of actions (see Ethics, below), living things are classified in a hierarchy according to the kinds of senses they have; the more senses a being has, the more ways it can be harmed or helped. Plants, various one-celled animals, and 'elemental' beings (beings made of one of the four elements—earth, air, fire, or water) have only one sense, the sense of touch. Worms and many insects have the senses of touch and taste. Other insects, like ants and lice, have those two senses plus the sense of smell. Flies and bees, along with other higher insects, also have sight. Human beings, along with birds, fish, and most terrestrial animals, have all five senses. This complete set of senses (plus, according to some Jain thinkers, a separate faculty of consciousness) makes all kinds of knowledge available to human beings, including knowledge of the human condition and the need for liberation from rebirth.

2. Epistemology and Logic

Underlying Jain epistemology is the idea that reality is multifaceted (anekanta, or 'non-one-sided'), such that no one view can capture it in its entirety; that is, no single statement or set of statements captures the complete truth about the objects they describe. This insight, illustrated by the famous story of the blind men trying to describe an elephant, grounds both a kind of fallibilism in epistemology and a sevenfold classification of statements in logic.

Every school of Indian thought includes some judgment about the valid sources of knowledge (pramanas). While their lists of pramanas differ, they share a concern to capture the common-sense view; no Indian school is skeptical. The Jain list of pramanas includes sense perception, valid testimony (including scriptures), extra-sensory perception, telepathy, and kevala, the state of omniscience of a perfected soul. Notably absent from the list is inference, which most other Indian schools include, but Jain discussion of the pramanas seem to indicate that inference is included by implication in the pramana that provides the premises for inference. That is, inference from things learned by the senses is itself knowledge gained from the senses; inference from knowledge gained by testimony is itself knowledge gained by testimony, etc. Later Jain thinkers would add inference as a separate category, along with memory and tarka, the faculty by which we recognize logical relations.

Since reality is multi-faceted, none of the pramanas gives absolute or perfect knowledge (except kevala, which is enjoyed only by the perfected soul, and cannot be expressed in language). As a result, any item of knowledge gained is only tentative and provisional. This is expressed in Jain philosophy in the doctrine of naya, or partial predication (sometimes called the doctrine of perspectives or viewpoints). According to this doctrine, any judgment is true only from the viewpoint or perspective of the judge, and ought to be so expressed. Given the multifaceted nature of reality, no one should take his or her own judgments as the final truth about the matter, excluding all other judgments. This insight generates a sevenfold classification of predications. The seven categories of claim can be schematized as follows, where 'a' represents any arbitrarily selected object, and 'F' represents some predicate assertible of it:

  1. Perhaps a is F.
  2. Perhaps a is not-F.
  3. Perhaps a is both F and not-F.
  4. Perhaps a is indescribable.
  5. Perhaps a is indescribable and F.
  6. Perhaps a is indescribable and not-F.
  7. Perhaps a is indescribable, and both F and not-F.

Each predication is preceded by a marker of uncertainty (syat), which I have rendered here as 'perhaps.' Some render it as ‘from a perspective,’ or ‘somehow.’ However it is translated, it is intended to mark respect for the multifaceted nature of reality by showing a lack of conclusive certainty.

Early Jain philosophical works (especially the Tattvartha Sutra) indicate that for any object and any predicate, all seven of these predications are true. That is to say, for every object a and every predicate F, there is some circumstance in which, or perspective from which, it is correct to make claims of each of these forms. These seven categories of predication are not to be understood as seven truth-values, since they are all seven thought to be true. Historically, this view has been criticized (by Sankara, among others) on the obvious ground of inconsistency. While both a proposition and its negation may well be assertible, it seems that the conjunction, being a contradiction, can never be even assertible, never mind true, and so the third and seventh forms of predication are never possible. This is precisely the kind of consideration that leads some commentators to understand the 'syat' operator to mean ‘from a perspective.’ Since it may well be that from one perspective, a is F, and from another, a is not-F, then one and the same person can appreciate those facts and assert them both together. Given the multifaceted nature of the real, every object is in one way F, and in another way not-F. An appreciation of the complexity of the real also can lead one to see that objects are, as they are in themselves, indescribable (as no description can capture their entirety). This yields the fourth form of predication, which can then be combined with other insights to yield the last three forms.

Perhaps the deepest problem with this doctrine is one that troubles all forms of skepticism and fallibilism to one degree or another; it seems to be self-defeating. After all, if reality is multifaceted, and that keeps us from making absolute judgments (since my judgment and its negation will both be equally true), the doctrines that underlie Jain epistemology are themselves equally tentative. For example, take the doctrine of anekantevada. According to that doctrine, reality is so complex that any claim about it will necessarily fall short of complete accuracy. The doctrine itself must then fall short of complete accuracy. Therefore, we should say, "Perhaps (or “from a perspective") reality is multifaceted." At the same time, we have to grant the propriety, in some circumstances, of saying, "Perhaps reality is not multifaceted." Jain epistemology gains assertibility for its own doctrine, but at the cost of being unable to deny contradictory doctrines. What begins as a laudable fallibilism ends as an untenable relativism.

3. Ethics

Given that the proper goal for a Jain is release from death and rebirth, and rebirth is caused by the accumulation of karma, all Jain ethics aims at purging karma that has been accumulated, and ceasing to accumulate new karma. Like Buddhists and Hindus, Jains believe that good karma leads to better circumstances in the next life, and bad karma to worse. However, since they conceive karma to be a material substance that draws the soul back into the body, all karma, both good and bad, leads to rebirth in the body. No karma can help a person achieve liberation from rebirth. Karma comes in different kinds, according to the kind of actions and intentions that attract it. In particular, it comes from four basic sources: (1) attachment to worldly things, (2) the passions, such as anger, greed, fear, pride, etc., (3) sensual enjoyment, and (4) ignorance, or false belief. Only the first three have a directly ethical or moral upshot, since ignorance is cured by knowledge, not by moral action.

The moral life, then, is in part the life devoted to breaking attachments to the world, including attachments to sensual enjoyment. Hence, the moral ideal in Jainism is an ascetic ideal. Monks (who, as in Buddhism, live by stricter rules than laymen) are constrained by five cardinal rules, the "five vows": (1) ahimsa, frequently translated "non-violence," or “non-harming,” satya, or truthfulness, asteya, not taking anything that is not given, brahmacharya, chastity, and aparigraha, detachment. This list differs from the rules binding on Buddhists only in that Buddhism requires abstention from intoxicants, and has no separate rule against attachment to the things of the world. The cardinal rule of interaction with other jivas is the rule of ahimsa. This is because harming other jivas is caused by either passions like anger, or ignorance of their nature as living beings. Consequently, Jains are required to be vegetarians. According to the earliest Jain documents, plants both are and contain living beings, although one-sensed beings, so even a vegetarian life does harm. This is why the ideal way to end one's life, for a Jain, is to sit motionless and starve to death. Mahavira himself, and other great Jain saints, are said to have died this way. That is the only way to be sure you are doing no harm to any living being.

While it may seem that this code of behavior is not really moral, since it is aimed at a specific reward for the agent—and is therefore entirely self-interested—it should be noted that the same can be said of any religion-based moral code. Furthermore, like the Hindus and Buddhists, Jains believe that the only reason that personal advantage accrues to moral behavior is that the very structure of the universe, in the form of the law of karma, makes it so.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Battacharya, Hari Mohan. Jaina Logic and Epistemology. Calcutta: K. P. Gagchi and Company, 1994.
    • A full explanation and critical examination of Jain theory of knowledge.
  • Battacharya, Narendra Nath. Jain Philosophy: Historical Outline. Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal Publishers, 1976.
  • Benesch, Walter. An Introduction to Comparative Philosophy. London: Macmillan Press, 1997.
    • A systematic comparison of Western philosophical systems with Asian, including Jain, systems.
  • Jacobi, Herman, trans. Jaina Sutras. Sacred Books of the East, vols 22 and 45. London: Oxford University Press, 1884.
    • The only English translation of the Jain scriptures.
  • Sharma, Arvind. A Jaina Perspective on the Philosophy of Religion. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidas, 2001.
  • Tatia, Nathmal, trans. That Which Is: Tattvartha Sutra. San Francisco: HarperCollins Publishers, 1994.
    • An early Jain handbook.

Author Information

Mark Owen Webb
Texas Tech University
U. S. A.

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani (d. 1020)

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani was a prominent Ismaili missionary during the reign of the Fatimid caliph-imam al-Hakim (996-1021). He was of Persian origin and was probably born in the province of Kirman. He seems to have spent the greater part of his life as a Fatimid da‘i (missionary) in Iraq (in Baghdad and Basra) and in central and western parts of Iran.Al-Kirmani was part of the official Fatimid campaign against the dissident da‘is, who had also proclaimed al-Hakim’s divinity. In Cairo he produced several works in refutation of the Druze movement and religion. Subsequently, al-Kirmani returned to Iraq where he completed his last and magnum opus, Rahat al-‘aql.

A prolific writer, al-Kirmani was one of the most learned Ismaili theologians of the Fatimid times. He was well-acquainted with the Hebrew text of the Old Testament, the Syriac version of the New Testament, and the post-Biblical Jewish writings. He expounded the Ismaili Shi‘i doctrine of the imamate in numerous writings. In a few treatises, al-Kirmani refuted the theological views of the Zaydis, the Twelver Shi‘is, and other Muslim opponents of the Fatimid Ismaili imams. Al-Kirmani was also an accomplished philosopher belonging to that select group of Ismaili da‘is of the Iranian lands who amalgamated in an original manner their Ismaili theology with different philosophical traditions, notably a type of Neoplatonism then current in the Muslim world.

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani was a prominent Ismaili da‘i or missionary and one of the most learned Ismaili theologians and philosophers of the Fatimid period. As in the case of other prominent missionaries who observed strict secrecy in their activities in the midst of hostile milieus, few biographical details are available on al-Kirmani, who flourished during the reign of the Fatimid caliph-imam al-Hakim (996-1021). Al-Kirmani is not mentioned in any contemporary Muslim historical sources, but highlights of his life and career can be gathered from his own numerous extant works as well as the writings of the later Musta‘li-Tayyibi Ismaili authors of Yaman.

Al-Kirmani’s date of birth remains unknown, but he was of Persian origin and was probably born in the province of Kirman. He seems to have spent the greater part of his life as a Fatimid da‘i in Iraq, having been particularly active in Baghdad and Basra. In Iraq, al-Kirmani successfully concentrated his efforts on local rulers and influential tribal chiefs, with whose support the Ismailis aimed to bring about the downfall of the ‘Abbasids. Alarmed by the successes of the Fatimid da‘wa or mission in Iraq, the ‘Abbasid caliph al-Qadir took retaliatory measures. In 1011, he sponsored the so-called Baghdad manifesto to discredit the Fatimids, also refuting their ‘Alid ancestry. The honorific title hujjat al-Iraqayn, meaning the hujja or chief da‘i of both Iraqs (al-Iraq al-Arabi and al-Iraq al-Ajami), which is often added to al-Kirmani’s name and may be of a late origin, implies that he was also active in central and western parts of Iran.

Al-Kirmani rose to prominence during the reign of al-Hakim, when the central headquarters of the Fatimid da‘wa in Cairo considered him as the most learned Ismaili theologian of the time. It was in that capacity that al-Kirmani played an important role in refuting the extremist ideas of some dissident da‘is, who were then founding what was to become known as the Druze movement and religion. As part of the official Fatimid campaign against the dissident da‘is, who had also proclaimed al-Hakim’s divinity, al-Kirmani was summoned in 1014 or shortly earlier to Cairo where he produced several works in refutation of the extremist doctrines. Al-Kirmani’s writings, which were widely circulated, were to some extent successful in checking the spread of the extremist doctrines associated with the initiation of the Druze movement. Subsequently, al-Kirmani returned to Iraq where he completed his last and magnum opus, Rahat al-‘aql, in 1020 and where he died soon afterwards.

A prolific writer, al-Kirmani was one of the most learned Ismaili theologians of the Fatimid times. He was well-acquainted with the Hebrew text of the Old Testament, the Syriac version of the New Testament, and the post-Biblical Jewish writings. He expounded the Ismaili Shi‘i doctrine of the imamate in numerous writings. In a few treatises, al-Kirmani refuted the theological views of the Zaydis, the Twelver Shi‘is, and other Muslim opponents of the Fatimid Ismaili imams. In his al-Aqwal al-dhahabiya, al-Kirmani refuted the ideas of Abu Bakr Mohammad b. Zakariya al-Razi (d. 934), who had argued for the necessity of revelation and prophethood while tracing all sciences to revelational origins. Al-Kirmani was also an accomplished philosopher belonging to that select group of Ismaili da‘is of the Iranian lands who amalgamated in an original manner their Ismaili theology (kalam) with different philosophical traditions, notably a type of Neoplatonism then current in the Muslim world. As a philosopher, al-Kirmani was fully acquainted with Aristotelian and Neoplatonic philosophies as well as the metaphysical systems of the Muslim philosophers (falasifa), notably al-Farabi, and Ibn Sina (Avicenna) who was his contemporary. In his Kitab al-riyad, al-Kirmani acted as an arbiter in a philosophical debate that had taken place earlier among some Iranian da‘is, notably Muhammad al-Nasafi, Abu YaRahat al-‘aql, which is written for the advanced adepts. In this book, al-Kirmani also propounded what may be regarded as the third stage in the development of Ismaili cosmology in medieval times. Al-Kirmani replaced the Neoplatonic dyad of the Intellect (‘aql) and Soul (nafs) in the spiritual world, which had been adopted by his Iranian Ismaili predecessors, by a series of ten separate Intellects in partial adaptation of al-Farabi’s Aristotelian cosmic system. Al-Kirmani’s cosmology, representing an original synthesis of different philosophical traditions, was not however adopted by the Fatimid Ismailis; it later provided the basis for the development of the fourth and final stage of Ismaili cosmology at the hands of the Musta‘li-Tayyibi scholars in Yaman.

References and Further Reading

  • W. Ivanow, Ismaili Literature: A Bibliographical Survey, Tehran, 1963, pp. 40-45. Contains a survey of al-Kirmani’s known works and their manuscripts, preserved mainly in Yaman and India.
  • I. K. Poonawala, Biobibliography of Ismaili Literature Malibu, Calif., 1977, pp. 94-102. Also contains a survey of al-Kirmani’s known works and their manuscripts, preserved mainly in Yaman and India.
  • J. van Ess, “Bibliographische Notizen zur islamischen Theologie. I. Zur Chronologie der Werke des Hamidaddin al-Kirmani”, Die Welt des Orients, 9, 1978, pp. 255-261. A partial chronology of al-Kirmani’s works.
  • W. Madelung, “Das Imamat in der frühen ismailitischen Lehre”, Der Islam, 37, 1961, pp. 114-127.
  • H. Corbin, Cyclical Time and Ismaili Gnosis, London, 1983, index.
  • F. Daftary, The Ismailis: Their History and Doctrines, Cambridge, 1990, pp. 113, 192-193, 196-197, 218, 227, 229-230, 235-236, 240, 245-246, 287, 291, 298.
  • Paul E. Walker, Early Philosophical Shiism, Cambridge, 1993, index.
  • Paul. E. Walker, Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani: Ismaili Thought in the Age of al-Hakim, London, 1999.
  • Daniel De Smet, La Quiétude de l’intellect: Néoplatonisme et gnose ismaélienne dans l’oeuvre de Hamid ad-Din al-Kirmani, Louvain, 1995.

Author Information

Farhad Daftary
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Bernard Lonergan (1904—1984)

When we try to reconcile opposing moral opinions we usually appeal to shared ethical principles. Yet often enough the principles themselves are opposed. We may then try to reconcile opposing principles by clarifying how we arrived at them. But since most of our principles are cultural inheritances, discussions halt at a tolerant mutual respect, even when we remain convinced that the other person is wrong. What is needed is a method in ethics that can uncover the sources of error. After all, even culturally inherited principles first occurred to someone, and that someone may or may not have been biased. So there is considerable merit to investigating the innate methods of our minds and hearts by which we construe – and sometimes misconstrue – ethical principles. The work of Bernard Lonergan can guide this investigation. His opus covers methodological issues in the natural sciences, the human sciences, historical scholarship, aesthetics, economics, philosophy and theology. He begins with an invitation to consider in ourselves what occurs when we come to knowledge. He then defines a corresponding epistemological meaning of objectivity. From there he lays out basic metaphysical categories applicable in the sciences. Finally, he proposes a methodical framework for collaboration in resolving basic differences in all these disciplines.

This review will begin by tracing the origins of Lonergan's approach. Following that will be the four steps of a cognitional theory, an epistemology, a metaphysics, and a methodology, particularly as they apply to resolving differences in moral opinions and in ethical principles. Finally, there will be a reexamination of several fundamental categories in ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Origins
  2. Cognitional Theory
  3. Epistemology (Objectivity)
  4. Metaphysics
    1. Genetic Intelligibility
    2. Dialectical Intelligibility
    3. Radical Unintelligibility
  5. Methodology
  6. Categories
    1. Action, Concepts, and Method
    2. Good and Bad
    3. Better and Worse
    4. Authority and Power
    5. Principles and People
    6. Duties and Rights
  7. Summary
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Major Works of Lonergan
    2. Shorter Works Relevant to Ethics
    3. Other Works

1. Origins

Bernard Lonergan, a preeminent Canadian philosopher, theologian and economist, (1904-1984) was the principal architect of what he named a "generalized empirical method." Born in Buckingham, Quebec, Lonergan received a typical Catholic education and eventually entered the Society of Jesus (Jesuits), leading to his ordination to the priesthood in 1936. He specialized in both theology and economics at this time, having been deeply influenced by his doctoral work on Thomas Aquinas and by his long-standing interest in the philosophy of culture and history, honed by his reading of Hegel and Marx. In the early 1950s, while teaching theology in Toronto, Lonergan wrote Insight: A Study of Human Understanding - his groundbreaking philosophical work. Then, in the early 70s, he published his equally fundamental work, Method in Theology. Throughout his career, he lectured and wrote on topics related to theology, philosophy, and economics. The University of Toronto has undertaken the publication of The Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan, for which 20 volumes are projected.

Lonergan aimed to clarify what occurs in any discipline - science, math, historiography, art, literature, philosophy, theology, or ethics. The need for clarification about methods has been growing over the last few centuries as the world has turned from static mentalities and routines to the ongoing management of change. Modern languages, modern architecture, modern art, modern science, modern education, modern medicine, modern law, modern economics, the modern idea of history and the modern idea of philosophy all are based on the notion of ongoing creativity. Where older philosophies sought to understand unchanging essentials, logic and law were the rule. With the emergence of modernity, philosophies have turned to understanding the innate methods of mind by which scientists and scholars discover what they do not yet know and create what does not yet exist.

The success of the empirical methods of the natural sciences confirms that the mind reaches knowledge by an ascent from data, through hypothesis, to verification. To account for disciplines that deal with humans as makers of meanings and values, Lonergan generalized the notion of data to include the data of consciousness as well as the data of sense. From that compound data, one may ascend through hypothesis to verification of the operations by which humans deal with what is meaningful and what is valuable. Hence, a "generalized empirical method" (GEM).

Lonergan also referred to GEM as a critical realism. By realism, in line with the Aristotelian and Thomist philosophies, he affirmed that we make true judgments of fact and of value, and by critical, he aimed to ground knowing and valuing in a critique of the mind similar to that proposed by Kant.

GEM traces to their roots in consciousness the sources of the meanings and values that constitute personality, social orders, and historical developments. GEM also explores the many ways these meanings and values are distorted, identifies the elements that contribute to recovery, and proposes a framework for collaboration among disciplines to overcome these distortions and promote better living together.

These explorations are conducted in the manner of personal experiments. In Insight and Method in Theology, Lonergan leads readers to discover what happens when they reach knowledge, evaluate options, and make decisions. He expects that those who make these discoveries about themselves reach an explicit knowledge of how anyone reaches knowledge and values, how inquiries are guided by internal criteria, and how therefore any inquiry may be called "objective." Such objectivity implies structural parallels between the processes of inquiry and the structures of what any inquirer, in any place or time, can know and value. Lonergan proposes that these structures, in turn, provide a personally verified clarification of the methods specific to the natural and human sciences, historiography and hermeneutics, economics, aesthetics, theology, ethics, and philosophy itself.

So there are four questions, as it were, that GEM proposes for anyone seeking to ground the methods of any discipline. (1) A cognitional theory asks, "What do I do when I know?" It encompasses what occurs in our judgments of fact and value. (2) An epistemology asks, "Why is doing that knowing?" It demonstrates how these occurrences may appropriately be called "objective." (3) A metaphysics asks “What do I know when I do it?” It identifies corresponding structures of the realities we know and value. (4) A methodology asks, "What therefore should we do?" It lays out a framework for collaboration, based on the answers to the first three questions.

In the following sections, a review of how ethicists familiar with GEM deal with each of these four questions will reveal dimensions that directly affect one's method in ethics.

2. Cognitional Theory

GEM relies on a personal realization that we know in two different manners - commonsense and theoretical. In both we experience insights, which are acts of understanding. In the commonsense mode, we grasp how things are related to ourselves because we are concerned about practicalities, our interpersonal relations, and our social roles. In the theoretical mode, we grasp how things are related to each other because we want to understand the nature of things, such as the law of gravity in physics or laws of repression in psychology. Theoretical insights may not be immediately practical, but because they look at the always and everywhere, their practicality encompasses any brand of common sense with its preoccupation with the here and now.

The theoretical terms defined in GEM should not be confused with their commonsense usage. To take a basic distinction, GEM defines morality as the commonsense assessments and behaviors of everyday living and ethics as the theoretical constructs that shape morality.

Each mode of knowing has its proper criteria, although not everyone reputed to have either common sense or theoretical acumen can say what these criteria are. A recurring theme throughout Lonergan's opus is that the major impediment in theoretical pursuits is the assumption that understanding must be something like picturing. For example, mathematicians who blur understanding with picturing will find it difficult to picture how 0.999... can be exactly 1.000.... Now most adults understand that 1/3 = 0.333..., and that when you triple both sides of this equation, you get exactly 1.000… and 0.999…. But only those who understand that an insight is not an act of picturing but rather an act of understanding will be comfortable with this explanation. Among them are the physicists who understand what Einstein and Heisenberg discovered about subatomic particles and macroastronomical events - it is not by picturing that we know how they function but rather by understanding the data.

Lonergan also notes that philosophers who blur the difference between picturing and the theoretical modes of knowing will be confused about objectivity. When it comes to understanding how the mind knows, they typically picture a thinker in here and reality out there, and ask how one gets from in here to out there - failing to notice that it is not by any picture but by verifying one's understanding of data that the thinker already knows that he or she really thinks.

GEM's goal of a theory of cognition, therefore, is not a set of pictures. It is a set of insights into the data of cognitive activities, followed by a personal verification of those insights. In disciplines that study humans, GEM incorporates the moral dimension by addressing how we know values that lead to moral decisions. So, in GEM's model of the thinking and choosing person, consciousness has four levels - experience of data, understanding the data, judgment that one's understanding is correct, and decision to act on the resulting knowledge. These are referred to as levels of self-transcendence, meaning that they are the principal set of operations by which we transcend the solitary self and deal with the world beyond ourselves through our wonder and care.

GEM builds on these realizations by the further personal discovery of certain innate norms at each of the four levels. On the level of experience, our attention is prepatterned, shifting our focus, often desultorily, among at least seven areas of interest - biological, sexual, practical, dramatic, aesthetic, intellectual, and mystical. On the level of understanding, our intellects pursue answers to questions of why and how and what for, excluding irrelevant data and half-baked ideas. On the level of judgment, our reason tests that our understanding makes sense of experience. On the level of decision, our consciences make value judgments and will bother us until we conform our actions to these judgments. Lonergan names these four innate norming processes "transcendental precepts." Briefly expressed, they are: Be attentive, Be Intelligent, Be reasonable, and Be responsible. But these expressions are not meant as formulated rules; they are English words that point to the internal operating norms by which anyone transcends himself or herself to live in reality. GEM uses the term authenticity to refer to the quality in persons who follow these norms.

Any particular rules or principles or priorities or criteria we formulate about moral living stem ultimately from these unformulated, but pressing internal criteria for better and worse. Whether our formulations of moral stances are objectively good, honestly mistaken, or malevolently distorted, there are no more fundamental criteria by which we make moral judgments. Maxims, such as "Treat others as you want to be treated," cannot be ultimately fundamental, since it is not on any super-maxim that we selected this one. Nor do authorities provide us with our ultimate values, since there is no super-authority to name the authorities we ought to follow. Rather, we rely on the normative criteria of being attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible; howsoever they may have matured in us, by which we select all maxims and authorities.

GEM includes many other elements in this analysis, including the roles of belief and inherited values, the dynamics of feelings and our inner symbolic worlds, the workings of bias, the rejection of true value in favor of mere satisfaction, and the commitment to love rather than hate.

3. Epistemology (Objectivity)

GEM may be characterized as a systems approach that correlates the subject's operations of knowing and choosing to their corresponding objects. Hence it understands objectivity as a correlation between the subject's intentionality and the realities and values intended. A subject's intention of objectivity functions as an ideal to be continuously approached. That ideal may be defined as the totality of correct judgments, supported by understanding, and verified in experience. Because our knowledge and values are mostly inherited, objectivity is the intended cumulative product of all successful efforts to know what is truly so and appreciate what is truly good. Clearly, we never know everything real or appreciate everything good. But despite any shortfalls, this principal notion of objectivity - the totality of correct judgments -- remains the recurring desire and the universal goal of anyone who wonders. In GEM's correlation-based, theoretical definition, such objectivity is a progressively more intelligent, reasonable and responsible worldview. Briefly put, an objective worldview is the fruit of subjective authenticity.

Confusion about objectivity may be traced to confusion about knowing. GEM proposes that any investigator who realizes that knowing is a compound of experience, understanding, and judgment may also recognize a persistent tendency to reduce objectivity to only one of these components.

There is an experiential component of objectivity in the sheer givenness of data. In commonsense discourse, we imagine that what we experience through our five senses is really "out there." But we also may refer to what we think is true or good as really "out there." Unfortunately, such talk stifles curiosity about the criteria we use to come to this knowledge. Knowing reality is easily reduced to a mental look. Similarly, the notion of moral objectivity collapses into a property of objects, detached from occurrences in subjects, so that we deem certain acts or people as "objectively evil" or "objectively good," where “objectively” means “out there for anyone to see.” This naiveté about objectivity condenses the criteria regarding the morality of an act to what we picture, overlooking the meanings that the actors attach to the act.

Beyond this experiential component, which bows to the data as "objectively" given, there is a normative component, which bows to the inner norming processes to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible. When we let these norms have their way, we raise relevant questions, assemble a coherent set of insights, avoid rash judgments, and test whether our ideas make sense of the data. This normative component is not a property of objects; it is a property of subjects. We speak of it when we say, "You're not being objective" or “Objectively speaking, I say....” It guards us against wishful thinking and against politicizing what should be an impartial inquiry. Still, while this view incorporates the subject in moral assessments, some philosophers tend to collapse other aspects of objectivity into this subjective normativity. For them, thorough analysis, strict logic, and internal coherence are sufficient for objectivity. They propose their structural analyses not as hypotheses that may help us understand concrete experience correctly but as complete explanations of concrete realities. The morality of an act is determined by its coherence with implacable theory, suppressing further questions about actual cases that fall outside their conceptual schemes.

Beyond the experiential and normative components of objectivity, there is an absolute component, by which all inquiry bows to reality as it is. The absolute component lies in our intention to affirm what is true or good independent of the fact that we happen to affirm it. It is precisely what is absent when what we affirm as real or good is not real or good. The absolute component lies neither in the object alone nor the subject alone but in a linking of the two. It exists when the subject's normative operations correctly confirm that the given experiential data meet all the conditions to make the judgment that X is so or Y is good. As a correlation between objective data and subjective acts, it corresponds to Aristotle's understanding of truth as a relation between what we affirm and what really is so. Moralists who collapse knowing into judgment alone typically overlook the conditions set by experience and understanding that make most moral judgments provisional. The result is the dogmatist, out of touch with experience and incapable of inviting others to reach moral judgments by appeal to their understanding.

4. Metaphysics

In popular use, metaphysics suggests a cloud of speculations about invisible forces on our lives. Among philosophers, metaphysics is the science that identifies the basic concepts about the structures of reality. GEM not only identifies basic concepts, but also traces them to their sources in the subject. Thus, concepts issue from insights, and insights issue from questions, and questions have birthdates, parented by answers to previous generations of questions. Moreover, the so-called raw data are already shaped by the questions that occur to an inquirer. These questions, in turn, contain clues to their answers insofar as the insight we expect is related to the kind of judgment we expect. It could be a logical conclusion, a judgment of fact, a judgment that an explanation is correct, or a judgment of value.

Because these complexities of human wonder are part of reality, GEM's metaphysics encompasses the relationship between the processes that guide our wonder and the realities we wonder about. The assumption is that when they operate successfully, the processes of wonder form an integrated set isomorphic to the integral dimensions of reality. For example, the scientific movement from data to hypothesis to verification corresponds to Lonergan's view that knowing moves from experience to understanding to judgment, as well as to Aristotle's view that reality consists of potency, form, and act. In GEM, then, metaphysics comprises both the processes of knowing and the corresponding features of anything that can be known.

This metaphysics is latent but operative before it is conceptualized and named. People who consistently tackle the right question and sidestep the wrong ones already possess latent abilities to discern some structured features of the object of their inquiry. With moral questions, their heuristic anticipations show up as seemingly innate strategies: Don't chisel your moral principles in stone. Consider historical circumstances. A bright idea is not necessarily a right idea. And so forth.

Eventually, these canny men and women may conceptualize and name their latent metaphysics. Should they ask themselves how they ever learned to discern the difference between good thinking and bad thinking, they may look beneath what they think about and wonder how their thinking works. They may realize what GEM takes as fundamental: Any philosophy will rest upon the operative methods of cognitional activity, either as correctly conceived or as distorted by oversights and mistaken orientations. Then, insofar as they correctly understand their cognitional activity, they may begin to make their latent metaphysics explicit.

In the remainder of this article, some of Lonergan's metaphysical terms particularly relevant to ethics are highlighted in bold face.

When we expect to understand anything, our insights fall into two classes. We can understand things as they currently function, or we can understand things as they develop over time. Regarding things as they currently function, we may notice that we have both direct insights and "inverse" insights. These correspond to two different kinds of intelligibilities that may govern what we aim to understand. Lonergan's use of "intelligibility" here corresponds to what Aristotle referred to as "form" and what modern science calls "the nature of."

A classical intelligibility (corresponding to the "classical" scientific insights of Galileo, Newton and Bacon) is grasped by a direct insight into functional correlations among elements. We understand the phases of the moon, falling bodies, pushing a chair - any events that result necessarily from prior events, other things being equal. A statistical intelligibility is grasped by an inverse insight that there is no direct insight available. But while we often understand that many events cannot be functionally related to each other, we also may understand that an entire set of such events within a specific time and place will cluster about some average. For if any subset of events we consider random varies regularly from this average, we will look for regulating factors in this subset, governed by a classical intelligibility to be grasped through a direct insight. Statistical intelligibility, then, does not regard events resulting necessarily from prior events. It regards sets of events, in place P during time T, resulting under probability from multiple and shifting events.

This distinction affects moral appeals to a "natural law." For example, those who hold that artificial birth control is morally wrong typically appeal to a direct, functional relationship between intercourse and conception. However, the nature of this relationship is not one conception per intercourse but the probability of one conception for many acts of intercourse - a relationship of statistical intelligibility. If this is the nature of births, then the natural law allows that each single act of intercourse need not be open to conception.

Regarding things as they develop over time, there are two basic kinds of development, again based on the distinction between direct and inverse insights.

A genetic intelligibility is grasped by a direct insight into some single driving factor that keeps the development moving through developmental phases, such as found in developmental models of stars, plants, human intelligence, and human morality. A dialectical intelligibility is grasped by an inverse insight that there is no single driving factor that keeps the development moving. Instead, there are at least two driving factors that modify each other while simultaneously modifying the developing entity.

These anticipations are key to understanding moral developments. Inquiry into a general pattern of moral development will anticipate a straight-line, genetic unfolding of a series of stages. Inquiry into a specific, actual moral development will anticipate a dialectical unfolding wherein the drivers of development modify each other at every stage, whether improving or worsening.

a. Genetic Intelligibility

Genetic intelligibility is what we expect to grasp when we ask how new things emerge out of old. In this perspective, the metaphysical notion of potency takes on a particularly important meaning for ethics. Potency covers all the possibilities latent in given realities to become intelligible elements of higher systems. What distinguishes creative thinkers is not just their habit of finding uses in things others find useless. They expect that nature brings about improvements even without their help as, for example, when floating clouds of interstellar dust congeal into circulating planets or when damaged brains develop alternate circuits around scar tissue.

In this universe characterized by the potency for successive higher systems, the field of ethics extends to anything we can know. Hence, the "goodness" of the universe lies partly in its potentials for more intelligible organization. Human concern is an instance, indeed a most privileged instance, of a burgeoning universe. A sense of this kind of finality commands respect for whatever naturally comes to be even if no immediate uses come to mind.

An ethics whose field covers universal potentials will trace how morality is about allowing better. It means allowing not only the potentials of nature to reveal themselves but also a maximum freedom to the innate human imperative to do better. It means thinking of any moral option as essentially a choice between preventing and allowing the exercise of a pure desire for the better. Thus, the work of moral living is largely preventive - preventing our neurotic fixations or egotism from narrowing our horizons, preventing our loyalties from suppressing independent thinking, or preventing our mental impatience from abandoning the difficult path toward complete understanding. The rest feels less like work and more like allowing a natural exuberance to a moral creativity whose range has not been artificially narrowed by bias.

In contrast, a commonsense view of the universe imagines only the dimensions studied by physicists. The rule is simple: Any X either does or does not exist. Without this rule, scientists could never build up knowledge of what is and what is not. However, in cases like ourselves, where the universal potency for higher forms has produced responsible consciousness, this rule does not cover all possibilities. We also make the value judgments that some Xs should or should not exist. To recognize that the universe produces normative acts of consciousness is to recognize that the universe is more than a massive factual conglomeration. It is a self-organizing, dynamic and improving entity. Its moral character emerges most clearly with us, in raising moral objections when things get worse, in anticipating that any existing thing may potentially be part of something better, and, sadly, in acting against our better judgment.

Another key metaphysical element within the dynamism of reality toward fuller being is the notion of development. GEM rejects the mechanist view that counts on physics alone to explain the appearance of any new thing. It also rejects the vitalist view that pictures a wondrous life force driving everything from atoms, molecules, and cells, to psyches, minds and hearts. The reality of development, particularly moral development, involves a historical sequence of notions about better and worse. We inherit moral standards, subtract what we think is nonsense and add what we think makes sense. Our inheritance is likewise a sum of our previous generation's inheritance, what they subtracted from it and added to it. Any moral tradition is essentially a sequence of moral standards, each linked to the past by an impure inheritance and to the future by the bits added and subtracted by a present generation.

Not every tradition is a morally progressing sequence, of course, but those that make progress alternate between securing past gains and opening the door to future improvements. GEM names the routines that secure gains a higher system as integrator. It names the routines within the emerged system that open the door to a better system a higher system as operator. Within a developing moral tradition, value judgments perform the integrator functions, while value questions perform the operator functions. The integrating power of value judgments will be directly proportional to the absence of operator functions -- specifically, any further relevant value questions. So we regard some values as rock solid because no one has raised any significant questions about them. Value judgments that are provisional will function as limited integrators - limited, to be exact, to the extent that lingering value questions function as operators, scrutinizing value judgments for factual errors, misconceived theories, or bias in the investigator.

Feelings may function as either operators or integrators. As operators, they represent our initial response to possible values, moving us to pose value questions. As integrators they settle us in our value judgments as our psyches link our affects to an image of the valued object. Lonergan names this linkage of affect and image a symbol. (This is a term that identifies an event in consciousness; it is not to be confused with the visible flags and icons we also call "symbols.") The concrete, functioning symbols that suffuse our psyches can serve as integrator systems for how we view our social institutions, various classes of people, and our natural environment, making it easy for us to respond smoothly without having to reassess everything at every moment. Symbols can also serve as operators insofar as the affect-image pair may disturb our consciousness, alerting us to danger or confusion, and prompting the questions we pose about values.

Although the operators that improve a community's tradition involve the questions that occur to its members, not all questions function as operators. Some value questions are poorly expressed, even to ourselves. We experience disturbing symbols, but have yet to pose a value question in a way that actually results in a positive change. Some value questions are posed by biased investigators, which degrade a community's moral heritage. Only those individuals who pose the questions that actually add values or remove disvalues will function as operators in an improving tradition. What makes any tradition improve, then, is neither the number of cultural institutions, nor governmental support of the arts, nor legal protections for freedom of thought, nor freedom of religion. These support the operators, and need to be regulated as such. But the operators themselves are the questions raised by the men and women who put true values above mere satisfactions.

The same alternating dynamic is evident in the moral development of an individual. While psychotherapists expect that an individual's age is not a reliable measure of moral maturity, those who understand development as an alternation of operators and integrators may pose their questions about a patient's maturity much more precisely: How successfully did this person meet the sequence of operator questions at turning points in his or her life? And what are the resultant integrator symbols guiding this person today? Similarly, in theories of individual development, what counts is what the operators may be at any stage. Where some theorists only describe the various stages, GEM looks for an account of a prior stage as integrator that connects directly to the operator questions to which an emerging stage is an answer.

b. Dialectical Intelligibility

The foregoing genetic model of development gives a gross view of stages and a first approximation to actual development. But actual development is the bigger story. Who we are is a unique weaving of the mutual impacts of external challenges and our internal decisions. So we come to the kind of intelligibility that accounts for concrete historical growth or decline - dialectical intelligibility. We expect this kind of understanding when we anticipate a tension among drivers of development and changes in these very drivers, depending on the path that the actual development takes.

Friendship, for example, has been compared to a garden that needs tending, but the analogy is misleading. What we understand about gardens falls under genetic intelligibility. Seeds will produce their respective vegetables, fruits or flowers; all we do is provide the nutrients. In a friendship, however, each partner is changed with each compromise, accommodation, resistance or refusal. So the inner dynamic of any friendship is a concrete unfolding of two personalities, each linked to the other yet able to oppose the other.

A community, too, is a dialectical reality. Its members' perceptions, their patterns of behavior, their ways of collaborating and disputing, and all their shared purposes are the concrete result of three linked but opposed principles: their spontaneous intersubjectivity, their practical intelligence, and their values.

Spontaneous Intersubjectivity: Our spontaneous needs and wants constitute the primitive, intersubjective dimensions of community. We nest; we take to our kind; we share the unreflective social routines of the birds and bees, seeking one particular good after another.

Practical Intelligence: We also get insights into how to meet our needs and wants more efficiently. We design our houses to fit our circumstances and pay others to build them. In exchange, others pay us to make their bread, drive them to work, or care for their sick. Here is where the intelligent dimensions of a community emerge, comprising all the linguistic, technological, economic, political and social systems springing from human insight that constitute a society.

Values: Where practical intelligence sets up what a community does, values ground why they do it. Here is where the moral dimensions of community emerge - the shoulds and should-nots conveyed in laws, agreements, education, art, public opinion and moral standards. They embody all the commitments and priorities that constitute a culture.

These three principles are linked. Spontaneously, we pursue the particular goods that we need or want. Intellectually, we discover the technical, economic, political and social means to ensure the continuing flow of these particular goods, and we adapt our personal skills and habits to work within these systems. Morally, we decide whether the particular goods and the systems that deliver them actually improve our lives. Yet the principles are forever opposed. Insight often suppresses the urges of passion, while passion unmoored from insight would carry us along its undertow. Conscience, meanwhile, passes judgment on both our choices of particular goods and the systems we set up to keep them coming.

A dialectical anticipation regards a community as a moving, concrete resultant of the mutual conditioning of these three principles. When spontaneous intersubjectivity dominates a community, its members' intellects are deformed by animal passion. When practical intelligence ignores spontaneous intersubjectivity, a society becomes stratified into an elite with its grand plans and a proletariat living from hand to mouth. Where members prefer mere satisfactions over values, intelligences are biased, and deeper human needs for authenticity are ignored. In any case, communities move, pushed and pulled by these principles, now converging toward, now diverting away from genuine progress.

c. Radical Unintelligibility

The idea of development implies a lack of intelligibility, namely, the intelligibility yet to be realized. Likewise, there is a lack of intelligibility in the distorted socio-cultural institutions and self-defeating personal habits that pose the everyday problems confronting us. Yet even these are intelligibly related to the events that created them.

What lacks intelligibility it itself, however, is the refusal to make a decision that one deems one ought to make. GEM follows the Christian tradition of the apostle Paul, of Augustine, and of Aquinas in recognizing the phenomenon that we can act against our better judgment. This tradition is aware that much wrongdoing results from coercion, or conditioning, or invincible ignorance, but it asserts nonetheless that we can refuse to choose what we know is worth choosing. Lonergan refers to these events as "basic sin" to distinguish them from the effects of such refusals on one's socio-cultural institutions and personal habits. Their unintelligibility is radical, in the sense that a deliberate refusal to obey a dictate of one's deliberation cannot be explained, even if, as often happens, later deliberation dictates something else. It is radical also in the etymological sense of a root that branches into the actions, habits and institutions that we consider "bad."

5. Methodology

Different media subdivide ethics in different ways. News media divide it according to the positions people take on moral issues. Many college textbooks divide it into three related disciplines: metaethics (methods), normative ethics (principles), and applied ethics (case studies). This division implies that we first settle issues of method, then establish general moral principles, and finally apply those principles straightaway into practice. GEM proposes that moral development is not the straight line of genetic development nourished solely by principles but rather a dialectical interplay of spontaneous intersubjectivity, practical intelligence, and values. So, instead of a deductive, three-step division of moral process, GEM expects moral reflection to spiral forward inductively, assessing new situations with new selves at every turn. The question then becomes how ethicists might collaborate in wending the way into the future.

In his Method in Theology, Lonergan grouped the processes by which theology reflects on religion into eight specializations, each with functional relationships to the other seven. As illustrated in the chart below, the four levels of human self-transcendence - being attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible – function in the two phases of understanding the past and planning for the future. Thus, we learn about the past by moving upward through research, interpretation, history, and a dialectical evaluation. We move into the future by moving downward through foundational commitments, basic doctrines, systematic organizations of doctrines, and communication of the resulting meanings and values. Our future slips into our past soon enough, and the process continues, turn after turn, reversing or advancing the forces of decline, meeting ever new challenges or buckling under the current ones.

While Lonergan presented this view primarily to meet problems in theology, he extended the notion of functional specialties to ethics, historiography and the human sciences by associating doctrines, systematics, and communications with policies, plans and implementations, respectively. These eight functional specialties are not distinct professions or separate university departments. They represent Lonergan's grouping of the operations of mind and heart by which we actually do better. That is, he is not suggesting a recipe for better living; he is proposing a theoretical explanation of how the mind and heart work whenever we actually improve life, along with a proposal for collaboration in light of this explanation.


The bottom three rows of functions will be initially familiar to anyone involved in practically any enterprise. The top row of functions is less familiar, but it represents Lonergan's clarification of the evaluative moments that occur in any collaboration that improves human living.

The functional specialty dialectic occurs when investigators explicitly sort out and evaluate the basic elements in any human situation. They evaluate the data of research, the explanations of interpreters, and the accounts of historians. To ensure that all the relevant questions are met, they bring together different people with different evaluations with a view to clarifying and resolving any differences that may appear.

From a GEM perspective, the most radical differences result from the presence or absence of conversion. Three principal types have been identified. There is an intellectual conversion by which a person has personally met the challenges of a cognitional theory, an epistemology, a metaphysics, and a methodology. There is a moral conversion by which a person is committed to values above mere satisfactions. And there is an affective conversion by which a person relies on the love of neighbor, community, and God to heal bias and prioritize values.

By attending to these radical differences, GEM rejects the typical liberal assumption that (1) people always lie, cheat and steal; (2) realistically, nothing can be done about these moral shortcomings; and (3) social institutions can do no more than balance conflicting interests. This assumption constricts moral vision to a pragmatism that may look promising in the short run but fails to deal with the roots of moral shortcomings in the long run. Dialectic occurs when investigators explicitly deal with each other's intellectual, moral and affective norms, under the assumption that converted horizons are objectively better than unconverted horizons.

The functional specialty foundations occurs when investigators make their commitments and make them explicit. Relying on the evaluations and mutual encounters that occur in the specialty, dialectic, investigators deliberately select the horizons and commitments upon which they base any proposed improvements. These foundations are expressed in explanatory categories insofar as investigators make explicit their latent metaphysics and the horizons opened by their intellectual, moral and affective conversions.

Regarding ethics, investigators use a number of categories to formulate ethical systems, to track developments, to propose moral standards, and to express specific positions on issues. By way of illustration below, there are six sets of categories that seem particularly important: (1) action, concepts and method, (2) good and bad, (3) better and worse, (4) authority and power, (5) principles and people, and (6) duties and rights.

While commonsense discourse uses these terms descriptively, GEM's theoretical approach defines them as correlations between subjective operations and their objective correlatives. An ethics based on GEM assumes that if science is to take seriously the data of consciousness, then it is necessary to deal explicitly with the normative elements that make consciousness moral. Because these subjective operations include moral norms and because their objective correlatives involve concrete values, the categories will not be empirically indifferent. Their power to support explanations of moral situations and proposals will derive from normative elements in their definitions, which, in turn are openly grounded in the innate norms to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible.

6. Categories

a. Action, Concepts, and Method

Interest in method may be considered as a third plateau in humanity's progressive enlargement of what has become meaningful.

  • A first plateau regards action. What is meaningful is practicality, technique, and palpable results.
  • A second plateau regards concepts. What counts are the language, the logic, and the conceptual systems that give a higher and more permanent control over action.
  • The third plateau regards method. As modern disciplines shift from fixed conceptual systems to the ongoing management of change, the success of any conceptual system depends on a higher control over its respective methods.

Morality initially regards action, but it has expanded into a variety of conceptual systems under the heading of ethics. It is these systems, and their associated categories, which are the focus of the third-plateau methodological critique. On the third plateau, concepts lose their rigidity. As long as investigators are explicit about their cognitional theory, epistemology and metaphysics, they will continually refine or replace concepts developed in previous historical contexts.

Although the second plateau emerged from the first and the third is currently emerging from the second, GEM anticipates that any investigator today may be at home with action only, with both action and concepts, or with action, concepts, and method. The effort of foundations is for investigators to include all three plateaus in their investigations. The effort of dialectic is to invite all dialog partners to do the same.

b. Good and Bad

Where second-plateau minds would typically name things good or bad insofar as they fall under preconceived concepts such as heroism or murder, liberation or oppression, philanthropy or robbery, third-plateau minds look to concrete assessments of situations. To ensure that this assessment is sufficiently grounded in theory, GEM requires an understanding of certain correlations between intentional acts and their objects. This requires more than a notional assent to concepts; it requires personally verified insight into what minds and hearts intend and how they intend it.

The relevant correlations that constitute anything called bad or good may be viewed according to the three levels of intentionality that dialectically shape any community. (1) Spontaneously, our interests, actions and passions intend particular goods. (2) Intelligently and reasonably, our insights and judgments intend the vast, interlocking set of systems that give us these particular goods regularly. (3) Responsibly and affectively, our decisions and loves intend what is truly worthwhile among these particular goods and the systems that deliver them.

In authentic persons, affectivity and responsibility shape reasonable and intelligent operations, which in turn govern otherwise spontaneous interests, actions and passions. This hierarchy in intentionality correlates with a priority of cultural values over social systems, and social systems over the ongoing particular activities of a populace. Thus, GEM regards human intelligence and reason as at the service of moral and affective orientations. This turns upside down the view of "materialistic" economic and educational institutions that dedicate intelligence and reason to serving merely spontaneous interests, actions, and passions.

At the same time, moral and affective orientations rely on intelligent and reasonable analyses of situations to produce moral precepts - an approach that contrasts with ethics that look chiefly to virtue and good will for practical guidance. Lonergan demonstrated how intelligent and reasonable analyses produce moral precepts in his works on the economy (Macroeconomic Dynamics: An Essay in Circulation Analysis) and on marriage ("Finality, Love, Marriage").

So GEM regards the concepts of good and bad as useful for expressing moral conclusions, provide they are rooted in intelligent analysis, dialectical encounter, and personal conversion. GEM relies on dialectical encounter to expose the oversights when "good" and "bad" are used to categorize actions in the abstract.

c. Better and Worse

The complexities of one's situation involve not only its history, but the views of history embraced by its participants. Darwinian, Hegelian and Marxist views of history are largely genetic, insofar as they support the liberal thesis that life automatically improves, and that wars, disease, and economic crashes are necessary steps in the forward march of history. GEM declares an end to this age of scientific innocence. It regards this thesis of progress as simply a first of three successively more thorough approximations toward a full understanding of actual situations. A second approximation takes in the working of bias and the resulting dynamics of historical decline. A third approximation takes in the factors of recovery by which bias and its objective disasters may be reversed.

First Approximation: What drives progress. We experience a situation and feel the impulse to improve it. We spot what's missing, or some overlooked potentials. We express our insight to others, getting their validation or refinement. We make a plan and put it into effect. The situation improves, bringing us back to feeling yet further impulses to improve things. The odds of spotting new opportunities grow as, with each turn of the cycle, more and more of what doesn't make sense is replaced by what does. Such is the nature of situations that improve.

Second Approximation: What drives decline. Again, we experience a situation and an impulse to improve it. But we do not, or will not, spot what's missing. We express our oversight to others, making it out to be an insight. If they lack any critical eye, they take us at our word rather than notice our oversight. We make a plan, put it into effect, and discover later the inevitable worsening of the situation. Now the odds of spotting ways to improve things decrease, owing to the additional complexity and cross-purposes of the anomalies. With each turn of the cycle, less and less makes sense. Such is the nature of situations that worsen.

Lonergan proposed that such oversights might be rooted in any of four biases endemic to consciousness: (1) Neurosis resists insight into one's psyche. (2) Egoism resists insight into what benefits others. (3) Loyalism resists insights into the good of other groups. (4) Anti-intellectualism resists insights that require any thorough investigation, theory-based analyses, long-range planning, and broad implementation. In each type, one's intelligence is selectively suppressed and one’s self-image is supported by positive affects that reinforce the bias and by negative affects toward threats to the bias.

Third Approximation: What drives recovery. GEM offers an analysis of love to show how it functions to reverse the dynamics of decline.

  • Love liberates the subject to see values: Some values result not from logical analyses of pros and cons but rather from being in love. Love impels friends of the neurotic and egoist to draw them out of their self-concern, freeing their intelligence to consider the value of more objective solutions. Love of humanity frees loyalists to regard other groups with the same intelligence, reason and responsibility as they do their own. Love of humanity frees the celebrated person of common sense to appreciate the more comprehensive viewpoints of critical history, science, philosophy and theology. Love of a transcendent, unreservedly loving God frees a person from blinding hatred, greed and power mongering, liberating him or her to a divinely shared commitment to what is unreservedly intelligible, reasonable, responsible and loving.
  • Love brings hope: There is a power in the human drama by which we cling to some values no matter how often our efforts are frustrated. Our hopes may be dashed, but we still hope. This hope is a desire rendered confident by love. Those who are committed to self-transcendence trust their love to strengthen their resolve, not only to act against the radical unintelligibility of basic sin, but also to yield their personal advantage for the sake of the common good. Such love-based hope works directly against biased positive self-images as well as negative images of fate that give despair the last word. To feel confident about the order we hope for, we do not look to theories or logic. We rely on the symbols that link our imagination and affectivity. These inner symbols are secured through the external media of aesthetics, ritual, and liturgy.
  • Love opposes revenge: There is an impulse in us to take an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth. While any adolescent can see that this strategy cannot be the foundation of a civil society, it is difficult to withhold vengeance on those who harm us. It is the nature of love, however, to resist hurting others and to transcend vengeance. It is because of such transcendent love that we move beyond revenge to forgiveness and beyond forgiveness to collaboration.

GEM's perspective on moral recovery aims to help historians and planners understand how any situation gets better or worse. It helps historians locate the causes of problems in biases as opposed to merely deploring the obvious results. It helps planners propose solutions based on the actual drivers of progress and recovery, as opposed to mere cosmetic changes.

d. Authority and Power

Common sense typically thinks of authority as the people in power. GEM roots the meaning of authority in the normative functions of consciousness and defines the expression of authority in terms of legitimate power.

An initial meaning of power is physical, and physical power is multiplied by collaboration. But in the world of social institutions, a normative meaning of power emerges - the power produced by insights and value judgments. Insights are expressed in words; words raise questions of value; judgments of value lead to decisions; decisions result in cooperation; and this kind of cooperation vastly reduces the physical power needed while achieving vastly better results. The social power of a community grows as it consolidates the gains of the past, restricts behaviors that would diminish the community's effectiveness, organizes labors for specific tasks, and spells out moral guidelines for the future. As normative, the memory and commitments involved in this heritage constitute a community's "word of authority."

The community appoints "authorities" to implement these tasks. Authorities are the spokespersons, delegates, and caretakers of a community's spiritual and material assets. Winning the vote does not confer an authority upon them; it confers a responsibility upon them to speak and embody the community's word of authority. The honor owed to them by titles and ceremony does not derive from any virtue of their persons but rather from the honorable heritage and common purpose with which they have been entrusted.

While the community's social power resides in its ways and means, not all its ways and means are legitimate. A community’s heritage is a mixed bag of sense and nonsense. To the extent that authorities lack the authenticity of being attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible, their power to build up is diminished. Even if everyone does what they say, inauthentic authorities will be blind to the higher viewpoints and better ideas needed to stave off chaos and seize opportunities for improving life together. Their power is justifiably called naked because it is stripped of the intelligent, reasonable, and responsible contributions their subjects are quite capable of making. Similarly, to the extent that the subjects lack authenticity, they will cripple their own creativity, which otherwise would foresee problems, overcome obstacles, and open new lines of development. At the extremes, a noble leader of egotistical followers has no more effective power than an egotistical leader of noble followers. Between these extremes, the typical dynamic is an ongoing dialectic between an incomplete authenticity of the community and an incomplete authenticity of its authorities.

In this concrete perspective, GEM defines authority as power legitimated by authenticity. That is, authority is that portion of a heritage produced by attention, intelligence, reason, and responsibility. As only a portion of a heritage, authority is a dialectical reality, to be worked out in mutual encounter, rather than a dictatorial iron law (a classical reality), an anarchical or libertarian social order (a statistical reality), or a natural, evolutionary dynasty (a genetic reality).

This definition of authority as the power legitimated by authenticity offers historians defensible explanations for their distinctions between legitimate and illegitimate exercises of power within a historical period. It offers policymakers the normative categories they need to explain to their constituents the reasons for proposed changes in the community's constitution, laws, and sanctions. It reminds authorities that they have been entrusted with the maintenance and refinement of a heritage created by the community.

e. Principles and People

A commonsense use of "moral principles" usually means any set of conceptualized standards, such as, “The punishment should fit the crime" or "First, do no harm.”

When ethicists consider how moral principles should be used, disagreements arise. Some scorn them because principles are only abstract generalizations that do not apply in concrete situations. When we try to apply them, disputes arise about the meaning of terms such as "crime" or "harm." Particular cases always require further value judgments on the relative importance of mitigating factors, which generalizations omit. What counts is a thorough assessment of the concrete situation, which will result in an intuition of what seems best.

Others reject such situation-based ethics because people have different intuitions about what seems best in particular situations. What is needed is a general principle that supports the common good. Moreover, history proves that formulated principles are good things. Because they represent wisdom gained by others who met threats to their well being, to neglect them is to unknowingly expose oneself to the same threats. We codify principles in our laws, appeal to them in our debates, and teach them to our children. For children in particular, and for adults whose moral intelligence has not matured, principles are firm anchors in a stormy sea.

GEM regards principles as concepts that need the critique of a third-plateau reflection on the methods used to develop them. They are not really principles in the sense of starting points. That is, they are not the source of normative demands. The actual sources of normative demands are self-transcending people being attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible. Formulated principles are the products of people shaped by an ambiguous heritage, exposed to a dialectic of opinions, and directed by personal commitments within intellectual, moral and affective horizons. These horizons may complement each other; they may develop from earlier stages; or they may be dialectically opposed, as when people who mouth the same principles attach opposite meanings to them, or when people espouse the principle but act otherwise.

GEM grants no exception for moral principles proposed by religions. A religious revelation is considered neither a delivery from the sky of inscribed tablets nor a dictation heard from unseen divinities. In its data of consciousness perspective, GEM considers revelation as a person's judgment of value regarding known proposals, whether inscribed or spoken or imagined. Its religious sanction is based on a person's claim that this judgment is prompted by a transcendent love from a transcendent source in his or her heart.

Those who formulate specific moral principles need to understand that there are distinct methodological issues associated with each of the eight specialties that form a group in consciousness. This understanding begins with men and women who think about their intellectual, moral and affective commitments in explanatory categories (foundations). It is first expressed in these categories as judgments of fact or value (doctrines/policies). It expands through understanding the relationships these principles have with other principles (systematics/planning). It becomes effective thorough adaptations that take into account the current worldview of a community, the media used, and the values implicit in the community's language (communications/implementation). These adaptations become data (research) for further understanding (interpretation) within historical contexts (history) to be evaluated (dialectic.)

GEM's strategy for resolving differences among principles is to exercise the functional specialty dialectic to reveal their true source. Investigators evaluate not only the historical accounts of how any principle arose, but also the principle itself. GEM proposes that where investigators overcome disagreements, the parties have lain open their basic horizons, particularly the intellectual, moral and affective horizons that reveal the radical grounds of disagreements and agreements. In this mutual encounter, people concerned about morality are already familiar with normative elements in their consciousness and may only lack the insights and language to make them intelligible parts of how they present their views. The strategy is not to prove one's principle or disprove another's but to tap one another's experience of a desire for authenticity. GEM counts on the probability that those people with more effective intellectual, moral and affective horizons will, by laying bare the roots of any differences, attract and guide those whose horizons are less effective.

Besides people who appreciate authenticity, there are people who crave its opposite, as the history of hatred amply demonstrates. If GEM has accurately identified the dialectic of decline as driven by an increasingly degraded authenticity, with its increasingly narrow and unconnected solutions to problems, then the reversal of moral evil must appeal to any remnants of authenticity in the hater. The appeal involves enlargements of horizons at many levels. For communities of hatred, this enlargement will require moving from legends about their heritage to a critical history, revising the rhetoric and rituals that secure commitment, and rewriting their laws. At the same time, there is also an enlargement to be expected of the communities who seek to convert communities of hatred. This is because more comprehensive political protocols and moral standards will be required to achieve a yet higher integration of those portions of both heritages that resulted from authenticity.

f. Duties and Rights

In the perspective of GEM, the elemental meaning of duty is found in the originating set of "oughts" in the impulses to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible, plus the overriding "ought" to maintain consistency between what one knows and how one acts. The oughts issued by conscience not only provide all the norms expressed in written rules, but also issue far more commands and prohibitions than parents, police, and public policy ever could. It is this inner duty that enables one to break from a minor authenticity that obeys the written rule and to exercise a major authenticity that may expose a written rule as illegitimate.

At first glance, the GEM view of morality may appear sympathetic to "deontological" theories that base all moral obligation on duty rather than consequences. While it is true that GEM traces all specific obligations to an underlying, universal duty, it goes deeper than concept-based maxims by identifying the dynamic originating duty in every person to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible. By tracing the source of any maxims about duty to their historical origins, GEM leaves open the possibility that new historical circumstances may require new maxims.

Moreover, insofar as any formulations of duty are consequences of past historical situations, and as new formulations will be consequences of new situations, GEM supports the consideration of consequences in ethical theory. What this approach adds, however, is the requirement that all consequences pass under the scrutiny of dialectic, which aims to filter merely satisfying consequences from the truly valuable, and to consider how specific consequences contribute to historical progress, decline, or recovery. These consequences include not only changes in observable behaviors and social standards but also any shifts in the intellectual, moral and affective horizons of a community.

As adults juggle their customary duties to social norms and their originating duty to be authentic, many discover that the best parts of these social norms arose from the authenticity of forebears. With this discovery comes a recognition of a present duty to preserve those portions of one's heritage based on authenticity, to critique those portions based on bias, and to create the social and economic institutions that facilitate authenticity.

Lonergan depicted such preservation, critique, and creativity as an ongoing experiment of history. The success of the race, and of any particular peoples, depends on collaborative efforts to conduct this experiment rather than serve as its guinea pigs. Collaboration, in turn, requires authenticity of all collaborators.

Any collaboration that successfully makes life more intelligible will require a freedom to speak one's mind, to associate, to maintain one's health, and to be educated. The notion of human rights, therefore, is a derivative of this intelligibility intrinsic to nourishing a heritage. While "rights" usually appear as one-way demands by one party upon others, their essential meaning is that they are expressions of the mutual demands intrinsic to any collaborative process aimed at improving life. Any individual's claim in the name of rights is essentially an assumption that others will honor his or her duty to contribute to the experiment to improve a common heritage.

Conflicts of rights are often the ordinary conflicts involved in any compromise. More seriously, they may be differences between plateaus of meaning among a community's members. First-plateau minds, focused on action, will think of rights as the behaviors and entitlements that lawmakers allow to citizens. Many will conclude that they have a right to do wrong. In contrast, GEM views lawmakers as responsible for protecting the liberty of citizens to live authentically. Thus, while the law lets every dog have a free bite, GEM repudiates the conclusion that anyone has a right to do wrong.

Second-plateau minds promote the ancient and honorable notion that rights are a set of immutable, universal properties of human nature. GEM considers that the strength of the modern notion of rights has been based mainly on logical consistency and permanent validity. However, from the methods perspective of the third plateau of meaning, GEM also recovers elements in the ancient notion of natural right that include personal authenticity and defines these elements in terms of personal conversion. On that basis, GEM proposes a collaborative superstructure driven by the functional specialties, dialectic and foundations.

In any case, GEM considers rights as historically conditioned means for authentic ends. As historically conditioned means, rights may take any number of legal and social forms. So, for example, the historical expansion from civil rights (speech, assembly, suffrage) to social rights (work, education, health care), to group rights (women, homosexuals, ethnic groups) is evidence of the ongoing emergence of new kinds of claims on each other's duty to replenish a heritage. As oriented toward authentic ends, the validity of any rights claim depends on how well it enables authentic living, a question addressed through the mutual exposures that occur in the functional specialty dialectic. Consequently, ethicists familiar with GEM rely less on the language of rights and more on the language of dialog, encounter, and heritage.

7. Summary

A generalized empirical method in ethics clarifies the subject's operations regarding values. The effort relies on a personal appropriation of what occurs when making value judgments, on a discovery of innate moral norms, and on a grasp of the meaning of moral objectivity. These innate methods of moral consciousness are expressed in explanatory categories, to be used both for conceptualizing for oneself what occurs regarding value judgments and for expressing to others the actual grounds for one's value positions.

GEM is based on a gamble that the odds of genuine moral development are best when the players lay these intellectual, moral and affective cards on the table. Concretely, this implies a duty to acknowledge the historicity of one's moral views as well as a readiness to admit oversights in one's self-knowledge. Moreover, given the proliferation of moral issues that affect confronting cultures with different histories today, it also implies a duty to meet the stranger in a place where this openness can occur.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Main Works of Lonergan

  • Insight: A Study of Human Understanding. Volume 3 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1997. Originally published 1957.
  • Method in Theology. New York: Herder & Herder, 1972.
  • "Cognitional Structure," Collection. Montreal: Palm, 1967, pp 221-239.
  • "Dimensions of Meaning," Ibid., pp 252-267.
  • "The Subject," A Second Collection. London: Darton, Longman & Todd, 1974, pp. 69-87.
  • Macroeconomic Dynamics: An Essay in Circulation Analysis. Volume 15 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1999.

b. Shorter Works Relevant to Ethics

  • "Finality, Love, Marriage." Collection, op. cit., pp 16-55.
  • "The Example of Gibson Winter," A Second Collection, op. cit., pp 189-192.
  • "The Dialectic of Authority," A Third Collection. New York: Paulist Press, 1985, pp 5-12.
  • "Method: Trend and Variations," ibid., pp 13-22.
  • "Healing and Creating in History," ibid., pp. 100-109.
  • "The Ongoing Genesis of Methods," ibid., pp. 146-165.
  • "Natural Right and Historical Mindedness," ibid., pp. 169-183.
  • "Lectures on Existentialism," Part Three of Phenomenology and Logic: The Boston College Lectures on Mathematical Logic and Existentialism, Volume 18 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan, op.cit., pp. 219-317.

c. Other Works

  • Melchin, Kenneth R. Living with Other People. Ottawa: St. Paul University Press, 1998.
  • Morelli, Mark D. and Morelli, Elizabeth A. The Lonergan Reader. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1997.

Author Information

Tad Dunne
U. S. A.

Nasir Khusraw (1004-1060)

Abu Mo’in Hamid al-Din Nasir ibn Khusraw is an important figure in the development of Ismaili philosophy. Much of his biography and philosophical ideology has been obtained through fragmented texts, both in poetry and prose.  Born into a politically connected family, Khusraw was well-educated and in the sciences and humanities.  Having spent most of his life occupying prestigious positions within the Sajuq court, Khusraw converted to the Ismaili faith at the age of forty after careful study.  He spent the rest of his life writing and advocating for the Ismaili faith, and eventually was forced into exile by Sunni authorities.

Consistent with other Ismaili philosopher, Khusraw’s cosmology is heavily inspired by Neoplatonism.  His metaphysics describes a God from which everything emanates and consistently strives back towards.  Through God, existence is cast into being through Universal Soul and Universal Intellect.  Each of these concepts provides the foundation for material objects, ascending from minerals to human beings.  Within each human being exists a soul and intellect, imperfect in form but existing within the Universals.   Khusraw interweaves his metaphysics within the Shi’i doctrine, requiring a divinely inspired guide to assist us in our journey to reconnect with Universal Intellect and Soul.  In holding to this cosmogonic description, Khusraw distinguishes his philosophy from previous Ismaili thought introduced by al-Farabi and picked up by Ibn Sina and al-Kirmani.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

In striking contrast to other Ismaili writers of the time (s.v., Hamid ai-din al Kirmani; Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani), many sources of information exist pertaining to Khusraw’s life.   Documentation was recorded,  with vary degrees of accuracy, by Khusraw himself, a (hostile) contemporary, and by later historians.  Since his death, Khusraw has been included in every major literary or historical survey of Ismailism.  Khusraw's life can be divided into four periods: his early years up to the age of forty (discernible from fragments of various texts); his conversion to Ismailism (of which he has left two different versions in the form of prose and poetry); his seven-year journey (documented in Safarnama); and his years of preaching followed by persecution and exile (drawn primarily from his poetry, but also a few statements in his philosophical works).

In 1004, Abu Mo’in Hamid al-Din Nasir ibn Khusraw was born in Qobadiyan, the district of Marv, in the eastern Iranian province of Khurasan. Along with two of his brothers, Khusraw occupied a high position in the administrative ranks of the Saljuq court - reportedly in the revenue department.  Evidence also suggests that he was familiar with the court of previous dynasty, the Ghaznavids.  Based on the quality of his writings, he received an excellent education in the sciences, literatures and philosophies of his time, including the study of Greek and Neoplatonic philosophy.  In his writing, Khusraw reportes examining the doctrines of the different Islamic schools and not being satisfied until he found and understood the Ismaili faith.  As a result of his conversion to Ismailism he embarked on a seven-year journey, during which time he spent three years in the Ismaili court in Cairo under the Fatimid caliph, al-Mustansir (1029-1094). The Fatimid dynasty (909-1171) aimed at creating an Islamic state based on Ismaili tenets, and thus presented a direct theological and military challenge to the Sunni ‘Abbasid caliphate based in Baghdad. Khusraw left Cairo as the head (hujjat) of Ismaili missionary activities in his home province of Khurasan.  After leaving Cairo, Khusraw was forced into exile by the Sunni authorities.  He spent the rest of his life exiled in the Pamir Mountains in Badakhshan, located in modern-day Tajikistan and Afghanistan.

2. Philosophy

Khusraw’s philosophical works reveal a strong Neoplatonic structure and vocabulary.  For example, his cosmogony closely follows Plotinus, moving from God and God’s word (logos) to Intellect, Soul, and the world of Nature.  Underlying each of the Ismaili cosmogonic systems is a fundamental division of the world into two realms, the esoteric (batin) and the exoteric (zahir).  From this division, everything in the physical world points to its counterpart in the spiritual, which is seen as its source, or true form.  The cosmogonic structure itself reveals a purposeful, providential unfolding from the spiritual realm into the physical world.  Conversely, as a reflection, the physical world seeks to grasp the spiritual realm and comprehend it.    In holding to this cosmogonic description, Khusraw follows his fellow Ismailis (Nasafi and al-Sijistani) while differentiating his theory from the structure introduced by al-Farabi and later adopted by Ibn Sina and the Ismaili philosopher al-Kirmani.

Khusraw begins with a discussion of tawhid (oneness, God’s unity), the clear understanding of which is the only way to achieve spiritual perfection. For Nasir, God Himself is indescribable beyond all categories of being and non-being (nothing which has an opposite can be ascribed to Him, since that would be limiting Him to human concepts).   However, from God emerges his Word (kalmia), ‘Be!’, which brings into existence Universal Intellect, perfect in potentiality and actuality.  Universal Intellect transcends time and space,  containing all being within itself.  Universal Intellect enjoys a worshipful intimacy with God and derives perfection from this intimacy.  From this worship emerges Universal Soul, perfect in potentiality but not in actuality because it is separated from God by Intellect.  Universal Soul recognizes its separation from God, and moves closer to God in a desire for the perfection enjoyed by Intellect.  Through its search for perfection, Universal Soul introduces the first movement into the entire structure, manifest in time and space.

The entire cosmos is set into motion through the movement of Universal Soul.  As a corollary, being is differentiated into two sets of opposites:  hot and cold, wet and dry.  Derived from these sets of opposites are the four elements: earth, air, fire, and water.  From these four elements arise the successive development of   minerals, plants, and animals.  Finally, as the summit of physical creation, human beings arise.  Within each human being exists an individual intellect and individual soul manifesting the same characteristics (but on a smaller level) as the universals.  In fact, the entire cosmos is formed on a matrix of Intellect and Soul; everything within the cosmos displays original intelligence and the search for perfection exhibited by the soul.

Khusraw’s ethics grow from and reflect this cosmogony. Each individual’s task is to recognize his or her own imperfections and then move to correct them, seeking the closest relationship possible with God.  For Khusraw, this is achieved by stringent and repeated application of the intellect to both physical and spiritual matters.  In order to correct these imperfections a believer must find a guide and study dilligently, perform all required religious acts with a full understanding, and supplement new understanding with higher levels of worldly activity.  As an Ismaili, Khusraw held the Shi‘i doctrine that God would not send a revelation without a guide to interpret it.  For the Ismailis, this guide must be a living person, the Imam of the Time.  As a living bridge between the two realms, this person must be divinely inspired, infallible, and perfectly capable of providing guidance in spiritual and worldly affairs.

3. References and Further Reading

The following sources elucidate Khusraw’s philosophy:

  • H. Corbin, "Nasir-i Khusrau and Iranian Ismailism," in The Cambridge History of Iran: Volume 4, ed., R. N. Frye (Cambridge 1975), pp. 520-42 and 689-90;
  • A. Hunsberger, "Nasir Khusraw: Fatimid Intellectual," in F. Daftary, ed., Intellectual Traditions in Islam (London 2000), pp. 112-29;
  • A. Hunsberger, Nasir Khusraw’s Doctrine of the Soul: From the Universal Intellect to the Physical World in Ismaili Philosophy, PhD thesis, Columbia University, New York, 1992;
  • S. Meskoob, Shahrokh, "The Origin and Meaning of ‘Aql (Reason) in the View of Nasir Khusraw," Iran Nameh, 6 (1989), pp. 239-57, and 7 (1989), pp. 405-29.

For a full bibliography of Nasir Khusraw’s works and ideas, see:

  • A. C. Hunsberger, Nasir Khusraw, the Ruby of Badakhshan: A Portrait of the Persian Poet, Traveller and Philosopher (London 2000).

For works still in manuscript, see:

  • I. K. Poonawala, Bibibliography of Ismaili Literature, Malibu, Calif., 1977, p. 123.

Author Information

Alice C. Hunsberger
Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Mencius (c. 372—289 B.C.E.)

menciusBetter known in China as “Master Meng” (Chinese: Mengzi), Mencius was a fourth-century BCE Chinese thinker whose importance in the Confucian tradition is second only to that of Confucius himself. In many ways, he played the role of St. Paul to Confucius’ Jesus, interpreting the thought of the master for subsequent ages while simultaneously impressing Confucius’ ideas with his own philosophical stamp. He is most famous for his theory of human nature, according to which all human beings share an innate goodness that either can be cultivated through education and self-discipline or squandered through neglect and negative influences, but never lost altogether. While it is not clear that Mencius’ views prevailed in early Chinese philosophical circles, they eventually won out after gaining the support of influential medieval commentators and thinkers such as Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE). (See Romanization systems for Chinese terms.) Today contemporary philosophical interest in evolutionary psychology and sociobiology has inspired fresh appraisals of Mencius, while recent philological studies question the coherence and authenticity of the text that bears his name. Mencius remains a perennially attractive figure for those intrigued by moral psychology, of which he was the foremost practitioner in early China.

Table of Contents

  1. The Mencius of History
  2. The Mencius of the Text
  3. Theodicy
  4. Government
  5. Human Nature
  6. Teleology
  7. Virtue Theory
  8. Moral Psychology
  9. Key Interpreters of Mencius
  10. References and Further Reading

1. The Mencius of History

Like the historical Confucius, the historical Mencius is available only through a text that, in its complete form at least, postdates his traditional lifetime (372-289 BCE). The philological controversy surrounding the date and composition of the text that bears his name is far less intense than that which surrounds the Confucian Analects, however. Most scholars agree that the entire Mencius was assembled by Mencius himself and his immediate disciples, perhaps shortly after his death. The text records several encounters with various rulers during Mencius' old age, which can be dated between 323 and 314 BCE, making Mencius an active figure no later than the late fourth century BCE.

The other major source of information about Mencius' life is the biography found in the Shiji (Records of the Grand Historian) of Sima Qian (c. 145-90 BCE), which states that he was a native of Zou (Tsou), a small state near Confucius' home state of Lu in the Shandong peninsula of northeastern China. He is said to have studied with Confucius' grandson, Zisi (Tzu-ssu), although most modern scholars doubt this. He also is thought to have become a minister of the state of Qi (Ch'i), which also was famous as the home of the Jixia (Chi-hsia) Academy. The Jixia Academy was a kind of early Chinese "think tank" sponsored the ruler of Qi that produced, among other thinkers, Mencius' later opponent Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE).

Mencius was born in a period of Chinese history known as the Warring States (403-221 BCE), during which various states competed violently against one another for mastery of all of China, which once was unified under the Zhou dynasty until its collapse, for all intents and purposes, in 771 BCE. It was a brutal and turbulent era, which nonetheless gave rise to many brilliant philosophical movements, including the Confucian tradition of which Mencius was a foremost representative. The common intellectual and political problem that Warring States thinkers hoped to solve was the problem of China's unification. While no early Chinese thinker questioned the need for autocratic rule as an instrument of unification, philosophers differed on whether and how the ruler ought to consider moral limitations on power, traditional religious ceremonies and obligations, and the welfare of his subjects.

Into the philosophical gap created by a lack of political unity and increasing social mobility stepped members of the shi ("retainer" or "knight") class, from which both Confucius and Mencius arose. As feudal lords were defeated and disenfranchised in battle and the kings of the various warring states began to rely on appointed administrators rather than vassals to govern their territories, these shi became lordless anachronisms and fell into genteel poverty and itinerancy. Their knowledge of aristocratic traditions, however, helped them remain valuable to competing kings, who wished to learn how to regain the unity imposed by the Zhou and who sought to emulate the Zhou by patterning court rituals and other institutions after those of the fallen dynasty.

Thus, a new role for shi as itinerant antiquarians emerged. In such roles, shi found themselves in and out of office as the fortunes of various patron states ebbed and flowed. Mencius' office in the state of Qi probably was no more than an honorary title. While out of office, veteran shi might gather small circles of disciples - young men from shi backgrounds who wished to succeed in public life - and seek audiences with rulers who might give them an opportunity to put their ideas into practice. The text of the Mencius claims to record Mencius' teachings to his disciples as well as his dialogues with the philosophers and rulers of his day.

2. The Mencius of the Text

Mencius inherits from Confucius a set of terms and a series of problems. In general, one can say that where Confucius saw a unity of inner and outer - in terms of li (ritual propriety), ren (co-humanity), and the junzi (profound person)-xiaoren (small person) distinction - Mencius tends to privilege the inner aspects of concepts, practices, and identities. For Mencius, the locus of philosophical activity and self-cultivation is the xin (hsin), a term that denotes both the chief organ of the circulatory system and the organ of thought, and hence is translated here and in many other sources as "heart-mind." Mencius' views of the divine, political organization, human nature, and the path toward personal development all start and end in the heart-mind.

Mencius' philosophical concerns, while scattered across the seven books of the text that bears his name, demonstrate a high degree of consistency unusual in early Chinese philosophical writing. They can be categorized into four groups:

  • Theodicy
  • Government
  • Human Nature
  • Self-Cultivation

3. Theodicy

Again, as with Confucius, so too with Mencius. From late Zhou tradition, Mencius inherited a great many religious sensibilities, including theistic ones. For the early Chinese (c. 16th century BCE), the world was controlled by an all-powerful deity, "The Lord on High" (Shangdi), to whom entreaties were made in the first known Chinese texts, inscriptions found on animal bones offered in divinatory sacrifice. As the Zhou polity emerged and triumphed over the previous Shang tribal rule, Zhou apologists began to regard their deity, Tian ("Sky" or “Heaven”) as synonymous with Shangdi, the deity of the deposed Shang kings, and explained the decline of Shang and the rise of Zhou as a consequence of a change in Tianming ("the mandate of Heaven"). Thus, theistic justifications for conquest and rulership were present very early in Chinese history.

By the time of Mencius, the concept of Tian appears to have changed slightly, taking on aspects of "fate" and “nature” as well as "deity." For Confucius, Tian provided personal support and sanction for his sense of historical mission, while at the same time prompting Job-like anxiety during moments of ill fortune in which Tian seemed to have abandoned him. Mencius' faith in Tian as the ultimate source of legitimate moral and political authority is unshakeable. Like Confucius, he says that "Tian does not speak - it simply reveals through deeds and affairs" (5A5). He ascribes the virtues of ren (co-humanity), yi (rightness), li (ritual propriety), zhi (wisdom), and sheng (sagehood) to Tian (7B24) and explicitly compares the rule of the moral king to the rule of Tian (5A4).

Mencius thus shares with Confucius three assumptions about Tian as an extrahuman, absolute power in the universe: (1) its alignment with moral goodness, (2) its dependence on human agents to actualize its will, and (3) the variable, unpredictable nature of its associations with mortal actors. To the extent that Mencius is concerned with justifying the ways of Tian to humanity, he tends to do so without questioning these three assumptions about the nature of Tian, which are rooted deep in the Chinese past, as his views on government, human nature, and self-cultivation will show.

4. Government

The dependence of Tian upon human agents to put its will into practice helps account for the emphasis Mencius places on the satisfaction of the people as an indicator of the ruler's moral right to power, and on the responsibility of morally-minded ministers to depose an unworthy ruler. In a dialogue with King Xuan of Qi (r. 319-301 BCE), Mencius says:

The people are to be valued most, the altars of the grain and the land [traditional symbols of the vitality of the state] next, the ruler least. Hence winning the favor of the common people you become Emperor…. (7B14)

When the ruler makes a serious mistake they admonish. If after repeated admonishments he still will not listen, they depose him…. Do not think it strange, Your Majesty. Your Majesty asked his servant a question, and his servant dares not fail to answer it directly. (5B9)

Mencius' replies to King Xuan are bracingly direct, in fact, but he can be coy. When the king asks whether it is true that various sage kings (Tang and Wu) rebelled against and murdered their predecessors (Jie and Zhou), Mencius answers that it is true. The king then asks:

"Is it permissible for a vassal to murder his lord?"

Mencius replied, "One who robs co-humanity [ren] you call a `robber'; one who robs the right [yi] you call a `wrecker'; and one who robs and wrecks you call an `outlaw.’ I have heard that [Wu] punished the outlaw Zhou - I have not heard that he murdered his lord. (1B8)

In other words, Wu was morally justified in executing Zhou, because Zhou had proven himself to be unworthy of the throne through his offenses against ren and yi - the very qualities associated with the Confucian exemplar (junzi) and his actions. This is an example of Mencius engaging in the "rectification of names" (zhengming), an exercise that Confucius considered to be prior to all other philosophical activity (Analects 13.3).

While Mencius endorses a "right of revolution," he is no democrat. His ideal ruler is the sage-king, such as the legendary Shun, on whose reign both divine sanction and popular approval conferred legitimacy:

When he was put in charge of sacrifices, the hundred gods delighted in them which is Heaven accepting him. When he was put in charge of affairs, the affairs were in order and the people satisfied with him, which is the people accepting him. Heaven gave it [the state] to him; human beings gave it to him. (5A5)

Mencius proposes various economic plans to his monarchical audiences, but while he insists on particular strategies (such as dividing the land into five-acre settlements planted with mulberry trees), he rejects the notion that one should commit to an action primarily on the grounds that it will benefit one, the state, or anything else. What matters about actions is whether they are moral or not; the question of their benefit or cost is beside the point. Here, Mencius reveals his antipathy for - and competition with – philosophers who followed Mozi, a fifth-century BCE contemporary of Confucius who propounded a utilitarian theory of value based on li (benefit):

Why must Your Majesty say "benefit" [li]? I have only the co-humane [ren] and the right [yi]. (1A1)

In the end, Mencius is committed to a type of benevolent dictatorship, which puts moral value before pragmatic value and in this way seeks to benefit both ruler and subjects. The sage-kings of antiquity are a model, but one cannot simply adopt their customs and institutions and expect to govern effectively (4A1). Instead, one must emulate the sage-kings both in terms of outer structures (good laws, wise policies, correct rituals) and in terms of inner motivations (placing ren and yi first). Like Confucius, Mencius places an enormous amount of confidence in the capacity of the ordinary person to respond to an extraordinary ruler, so as to put the world in order. The question is, how does Mencius account for this optimism in light of human nature?

5. Human Nature

Mencius is famous for claiming that human nature (renxing) is good. As with most reductions of philosophical positions to bumper-sticker slogans, this statement oversimplifies Mencius' position. In the text, Mencius takes a more careful route in order to arrive at this view. Following A. C. Graham, one can see his argument as having three elements: (1) a teleology, (2) a virtue theory, and (3) a moral psychology.

6. Teleology

Mencius' basic assertion is that "everyone has a heart-mind which feels for others." (2A6) As evidence, he makes two appeals: to experience, and to reason. Appealing to experience, he says:

Supposing people see a child fall into a well - they all have a heart-mind that is shocked and sympathetic. It is not for the sake of being on good terms with the child's parents, and it is not for the sake of winning praise for neighbors and friends, nor is it because they dislike the child's noisy cry. (2A6)

It is important to point out here that Mencius says nothing about acting on this automatic affective-cognitive response to suffering that he ascribes to the bystanders at the well tragedy. It is merely the feeling that counts. Going further and appealing to reason, Mencius argues:

Judging by this, without a heart-mind that sympathizes one is not human; without a heart-mind aware of shame, one is not human; without a heart-mind that defers to others, one is not human; and without a heart-mind that approves and condemns, one is not human. (2A6)

Thus, Mencius makes an assertion about human beings - all have a heart-mind that feels for others - and qualifies his assertion with appeals to common experience and logical argument. This does little to distinguish him from other early Chinese thinkers, who also noticed that human beings were capable of altruism as well as selfishness. What remains is for him to explain why other thinkers are incorrect when they ascribe positive evil to human nature - that human beings are such that they actively seek to do wrong.

7. Virtue Theory

Mencius goes further and identifies the four basic qualities of the heart-mind (sympathy, shame, deference, judgment) not only as distinguishing characteristics of human beings - what makes the human being qua human being really human - but also as the "sprouts" (duan) of the four cardinal virtues:

A heart-mind that sympathizes is the sprout of co-humanity [ren]; a heart-mind that is aware of shame is the sprout of rightness [yi]; a heart-mind that defers to others is the sprout of ritual propriety [li]; a heart-mind that approves and condemns is the sprout of wisdom [zhi]…. If anyone having the four sprouts within himself knows how to develop them to the full, it is like fire catching alight, or a spring as it first bursts through. If able to develop them, he is able to protect the entire world; if unable, he is unable to serve even his parents. (2A6)

Now the complexity of Mencius' seemingly simplistic position becomes clearer. What makes us human is our feelings of commiseration for others' suffering; what makes us virtuous - or, in Confucian parlance, junzi - is our development of this inner potential. To paraphrase Irene Bloom on this point, there is no sharp conflict between "nature" and “nurture” in Mencius; biology and culture are co-dependent upon one another in the development of the virtues. If our sprouts are left untended, we can be no more than merely human - feeling sorrow at the suffering of another, but unable or unwilling to do anything about it. If we tend our sprouts assiduously -- through education in the classical texts, formation by ritual propriety, fulfillment of social norms, etc. - we can not only avert the suffering of a few children in some wells, but also bring about peace and justice in the entire world. This is the basis of Mencius' appeal to King Hui of Liang (r. 370-319 BCE):

[The king] asked abruptly, "How shall the world be settled?"

"It will be settled by unification," I [Mencius] answered.

"Who will be able to unify it?"

"Someone without a taste for killing will be able to unify it…. Has Your Majesty noticed rice shoots? If there is drought during the seventh and eighth months, the shoots wither, but if dense clouds gather in the sky and a torrent of rain falls, the shoots suddenly revive. When that happens, who could stop it? … Should there be one without a taste for killing, the people will crane their necks looking out for him. If that does happen, the people will go over to him as water tends downwards, in a torrent - who could stop it? (1A6)

Mencius devotes some energy to arguing that "rightness" (yi) is internal, rather than external, to human beings. He does so using examples taken from that quintessentially Confucian arena of human relations, filial piety (xiao). Comparing the rightness that manifests itself in filial piety to such visceral activities as eating, drinking, and sexual intercourse, Mencius points out that, just as one's attraction or repulsion regarding these activities is determined by one's internal orientation (hunger, thirst, lust), one's filial behavior is determined by one’s inner attitudes, as the following imaginary dialogue with one of his opponents shows:

[Ask the opponent] "Which do you respect, your uncle or your younger brother?" He will say, "My uncle.” “When your younger brother is impersonating an ancestor at a sacrifice, then which do you respect?" He will say, "My younger brother.” You ask him, “What has happened to your respect for your uncle?" He will say, "It is because of the position my younger brother occupies." (6A5)

In other words, the rightness that one manifests in filial piety is not dependent on fixed, external categories, such as the status of one's younger brother qua younger brother or one’s uncle qua one's uncle. If it were, one always would show respect to one’s uncle and never to one's younger brother or anyone else junior to oneself. But as it happens, shifts in external circumstances can effect changes in status; one's younger brother can temporarily assume the status of a very senior ancestor in the proper ritual context, thus earning the respect ordinarily given to seniors and never shown to juniors. For Mencius, this demonstrates that the internal orientation of the agent (e.g., rightness) determines the moral value of given behaviors (e.g., filial piety).

Having made a teleological argument from the inborn potential of human beings to the presumption of virtues that can be developed, Mencius then offers his sketch of moral psychology - the structures within the human person that make such potential identifiable and such development possible.

8. Moral Psychology

The primary function of Mencius' moral psychology is to explain how moral failure is possible and how it can be avoided. As Antonio S. Cua has noted, for Mencius, moral failure is the failure to develop one's xin (heart-mind). In order to account for the moral mechanics of the xin, Mencius offers a quasi-physiological theory involving qi (vital energy) - "a hard thing to speak about" (2A2), part vapor, part fluid, found in the atmosphere and in the human body, that regulates affective-cognitive processes as well as one's general well-being. It is especially abundant outdoors at night and in the early morning, which is why taking fresh air at these times can act as a physical and spiritual tonic (6A8). When Mencius is asked about his personal strengths, he says:

I know how to speak, and I am good at nourishing my flood-like qi. (2A2)

It is interesting to note the apparent link between powers of suasion - essential for any itinerant Warring States shi, whether official or teacher - and "flood-like qi." The goal of Mencian self-cultivation is to bring one's qi, xin, and yan (words) together in a seamless blend of rightness (yi) and ritual propriety (li). Mencius goes on to describe what he means by "flood-like qi":

It is the sort of qi that is utmost in vastness, utmost in firmness. If, by uprightness, you nourish it and do not interfere with it, it fills the space between Heaven and Earth. It is the sort of qi that matches the right [yi] with the Way [Dao]; without these, it starves. It is generated by the accumulation of right [yi] - one cannot attain it by sporadic righteousness. If anything one does fails to meet the standards of one's heart-mind, it starves. (2A2)

It is here that Mencius is at his most mystical, and recent scholarship has suggested that he and his disciples may have practiced a form of meditative discipline akin to yoga. Certainly, similar-sounding spiritual exercises are described in other early Chinese texts, such as the Neiye ("Inner Training") chapter of the Guanzi (Kuan-tzu, c. 4th-2nd centuries BCE). It also is at this point that Mencius seems to depart most radically from what is known about the historical Confucius' teachings. While faint glimpses of what may be ascetic and meditative disciplines sometimes appear in the Analects, nowhere in the text are there detailed discussions of nurturing one's qi such as can be found in Mencius 2A2.

In spite of the mystical tone of this passage, however, all that the text really says is that qi can be nurtured through regular acts of "rightness" (yi). It goes on to say that qi flows from one's xin (2A2), that one’s xin must undergo great discipline in order to produce "flood-like qi" (6B15), and that a well-developed xin will manifest itself in radiance that shines from one's qi into one’s face and general appearance (7A21). In short, here is where Mencius' case for human nature seems to leave philosophy and reasoned argumentation behind and step into the world of ineffability and religious experience. There is no reason, of course, why Mencius shouldn't take this step; as Alan K. L. Chan has pointed out, ethics and spirituality are not mutually exclusive, either in the Mencius or elsewhere.

To sum up, both biology and culture are important for Mencian self-cultivation, and so is Tian. "By fully developing one's heart-mind, one knows one's nature, and by knowing one’s nature, one knows Heaven." (7A1) One cannot help but begin with "a heart-mind that feels for others," but the journey toward full humanity is hardly complete without having taken any steps beyond one's birth. Guided by the examples of ancient sages and the ritual forms and texts they have left behind, one starts to develop one's heart-mind further by nurturing its qi through habitually doing what is right, cultivating its "sprouts" into virtues, and bringing oneself up and out from the merely human to that which Tian intends for one, which is to become a sage. Nature is crucial, but so is nurture. Mencius' model of moral psychology is both a "discovery" model (human nature is good) and a "development" model (human nature can be made even better):

A person's surroundings transform his qi just as the food he eats changes his body. (7A36)

9. Key Interpreters of Mencius

Detailed discussion of Mencius' key interpreters is best reserved for an article on Confucian philosophy. Nonetheless, an outline of the most important commentators and their philosophical trajectories is worth including here.

The two best known early interpreters of Mencius' thought - besides the compilers of the Mencius themselves - are the Warring States philosophers Gaozi (Kao-tzu, 300s BCE) and Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE). Gaozi, who is known only from the Mencius, evidently knew Mencius personally, but Xunzi knew him only retrospectively. Both disagreed with Mencius' views on human nature.

Gaozi's dialogue with Mencius on human nature can be found in book six of the Mencius, in which both Mencius' disciples and Gaozi himself question him on his points of disagreement with Gaozi. Gaozi - whom later Confucians identified, probably anachronistically, as a Daoist -- offers multiple hypotheses about human nature, each of which Mencius refutes in Socratic fashion. Gaozi first argues that human nature is neither bad nor good, and presents two organic metaphors for its moral neutrality: wood (which can be carved into any object) and water (which can be made to flow east or west).

Challenging the carved wood metaphor, Mencius points out that in carving wood into a cup or bowl, one violates the wood's nature, which is to become a tree. Does one then violate a human being's nature by training him to be good? No, he says, it is possible to violate a human being's nature by making him bad, but his nature is to become good. As for the water metaphor, Mencius rejects it by remarking that human nature flows to the good, just as water's nature flows down. It is possible to make people bad, just as it is possible to make water flow up - but neither is a natural process or end. "Although man can be made to become bad, his nature remains as it was." (6A2)

Like Mencius, Xunzi claims to interpret Confucius' thought authentically, but leavens it with his own contributions. While neither Gaozi nor Mencius is willing to entertain the notion that human beings might originally be evil, this is the cornerstone of Xunzi's position on human nature. Against Mencius, Xunzi defines human nature as what is inborn and unlearned, and then asks why education and ritual are necessary for Mencius if people really are good by nature. Whereas Mencius claims that human beings are originally good but argues for the necessity of self-cultivation, Xunzi claims that human beings are originally bad but argues that they can be reformed, even perfected, through self-cultivation. Also like Mencius, Xunzi sees li as the key to the cultivation of renxing.

Although Xunzi condemns Mencius' arguments in no uncertain terms, when one has risen above the smoke and din of the fray, one may see that the two thinkers share many assumptions, including one that links each to Confucius: the assumption that human beings can be transformed by participation in traditional aesthetic, moral, and social disciplines. (Gaozi's metaphor of carved wood, incidentally, is one of Xunzi's favorites.) Through an accident of history, Mencius had no occasion to meet Xunzi and thus no opportunity to refute his arguments, but if he had, he might have replied that Xunzi cannot truly believe in the original depravity of human beings, or else he could not place such great faith in the morally-transformative power of culture.

Later interpreters of Mencius' thought between the Tang and Ming dynasties are often grouped together under the label of "Neo-Confucianism." This term has no cognate in classical Chinese, but is useful insofar as it unites several thinkers from disparate eras who share common themes and concerns. Thinkers such as Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-1077 CE), Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE), while distinct from one another, agree on the primacy of Confucius as the fountainhead of the Confucian tradition, share Mencius' understanding of human beings as innately good, and revere the Mencius as one of the "Four Books" -- authoritative textual sources for standards of ritual, moral, and social propriety. Zhang Zai's interest in qi as the unifier of all things surely must have been stimulated by Mencius' theories, while Wang Yangming’s search for li (cosmic order or principle) in the heart-mind evokes Mencius 6A7: "What do all heart-minds have in common? Li [cosmic order] and yi [rightness]." Both thinkers also display a bent toward the cosmological and metaphysical which disposes them toward the mysticism of Mencius 2A2, and betrays the influence of Buddhism (of which Mencius knew nothing) and Daoism (of which Mencius indicates little knowledge) on their thought.

During the Qing (Ch'ing) dynasty (1644-1911 CE), late Confucian thinkers such as Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1724-1777 CE) developed critiques of Xunzi that aimed at the vindication of Mencius' position on human nature. Kwong-loi Shun has pointed out that Dai Zhen's defense of Mencius actually owes more to Xunzi than to Mencius, particularly in regard to how Dai Zhen sees one's heart-mind as learning to appreciate li (cosmic order) and yi (rightness), rather than naturally taking pleasure in such things, as Mencius would have it. Although Dai Zhen shares Mencius' view of the centrality of the heart-mind in moral development, in the end, he does not ascribe to the heart-mind the same kind of ethical directionality that Mencius finds there.

More recently, the philosophers Roger Ames and Donald Munro have developed postmodern readings of Mencius that involve contemporary developments such as process thought and evolutionary psychology. Although their philosophical points of departure differ, both Ames and Munro share a distaste for the prominence of Tian in Mencius' thought, and each seeks in his own way to separate the "essence" of Mencian thought from the “dross.” For Ames, the "essence" - although, as a postmodern thinker, he rejects any notion of "essentialism" - is Mencius' “process” model of human nature and the cosmos, while the "dross" is Mencius' understanding of Tian as transcendent, which (in Ames' reading) undermines human agency. For Munro, the "essence" is Mencius’ grounding ethics in inborn nature, while the "dross" is Mencius' appeals to Tian as the author of that inborn nature. Their work is an attempt to make Mencius not only intelligible, but also valuable, to contemporary Westerners. At the same time, critics have noted that much of the authentic Mencius may be discarded on the cutting room floor in this process of reclaiming him for contemporary minds. One thinks of David Nivison's warning to philosophers, past and present, not to indulge in "wishful thinking" and excise or explain away what one does not wish to see in the Mencius.

This cursory review of some important interpreters of Mencius' thought illustrates a principle that ought to be followed by all who seek to understanding Mencius' philosophical views: suspicion of the sources. Almost all of our sources for reconstructing Mencius' views postdate him or come from a hand other than his own, and thus all should be used with caution and with an eye toward possible influences from outside of fourth century BCE China.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Allan, Sarah. The Way of Water and Sprouts of Virtue. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Ames, Roger T. "Mencius and a Process Notion of Human Nature," in Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press, 2002), 72-90.
  • Ames, Roger T. "The Mencian Conception of ren xing: Does It Mean `Human Nature'?" in Chinese Texts and Philosophical Contexts: Essays Dedicated to Angus C. Graham, ed. Henry Rosemont, Jr. (La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1991), 143-175.
  • Berthrong, John. "Trends in the Interpretation of Confucian Religiosity," in The Confucian-Christian Encounter in Historical and Contemporary Perspective, ed. Peter K. H. Lee (Lewiston, ME: Edwin Mellen Press, 1991), 226-254.
  • Bloom, Irene. "Biology and Culture in the Mencian View of Human Nature," in Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press, 2002), 91-102.
  • Bloom, Irene. "Mencian Arguments on Human Nature (jen-hsing)." Philosophy East and West 44/1 (1994): 19-53.
  • Boodberg, Peter A. "The Semasiology of Some Primary Confucian Concepts," in Selected Works of Peter A. Boodberg, ed. Alvin P. Cohen (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1979), 26-40.
  • Bosley, Richard. "Do Mencius and Hume Make the Same Ethical Mistake?" Philosophy East and West 38/1 (1988): 3-18.
  • Brooks, Bruce, and E. Taeko Brooks. "The Nature and Historical Context of the Mencius," in Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press, 2002), 242-281.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Cua, Antonio S. "Xin and Moral Failure: Notes on an Aspect of Mencius' Moral Psychology," in Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press, 2002), 126-150.
  • Dobson, W. A. C. H., trans. Mencius. Toronto and Buffalo: University of Toronto Press, 1963.
  • Eno, Robert. The Confucian Creation of Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Graham, A. C. Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1989.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. Ethics in the Confucian Tradition: The Thought of Mencius and Wang Yang-ming. Atlanta: Scholars Press, 1990.
  • Lau, D. C. "Meng tzu (Mencius)," in Early Chinese Texts: A Bibliographical Guide, ed. Michael Loewe (Berkeley: Society for the Study of Early China and the Institute of East Asian Studies, University of California, Berkeley, 1993), 331-335.
  • Lau, D. C. trans. Mencius. 2 vols. Hong Kong: Chinese University Press, 1984.
  • Lau, D. C. "On Mencius' Use of the Method of Analogy in Argument." In Lau, trans., Mencius (London: Penguin Books, 1970), 235-263.
  • Legge, James, trans. The Works of Mencius. New York: Dover Publications, 1970.
  • Munro, Donald J. "Mencius and an Ethics of the New Century," in Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press, 2002), 305-316.
  • Munro, Donald J. The Concept of Man In Early China. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1969.
  • Nivison, David S. "The Classical Philosophical Writings," in The Cambridge History of Ancient China: From the Origins of Civilization to 221 B.C., ed. Michael Loewe and Edward L. Shaughnessy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), 745-812.
  • Nivison, David S. The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Bryan W. Van Norden. Chicago and La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1996.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin I. The World of Thought in Ancient China. Cambridge, MA: The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. "Mencius, Xunzi, and Dai Zhen: A Study of the Mengzi ziyi shuzheng," in Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, ed. Alan K. L. Chan (Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press, 2002), 216-241.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi. Mencius and Early Chinese Thought. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1997.
  • Taylor, Rodney L. "The Religious Character of the Confucian Tradition." Philosophy East and West 48/1 (January 1998): 80-107.
  • Yearley, Lee H. Mencius and Aquinas: Theories of Virtue and Conceptions of Courage. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.

Author Information

Jeffrey Richey
Berea College
U. S. A.

Clarence Irving Lewis (1883-1964)

A major American pragmatist educated at Harvard, C. I. Lewis taught at the University of California from 1911 to 1919 and at Harvard from 1920 until his retirement in 1953. Known as the father of modern modal logic and as a proponent of the given in epistemology, he also was an influential figure in value theory and ethics.

Lewis’s philosophy as a whole reveals a systematic unity in which logic, epistemology, value theory and ethics all take their place as forms of rational conduct in its broadest sense of self-directed agency. In his first major work, Mind and the World Order (MWO), published in 1929, Lewis put forward a position he called “conceptualistic pragmatism” according to which empirical knowledge depends upon a sensuous ‘given’, the constructive activity of a mind and a set of a priori concepts which the agent brings to, and thereby interprets, the given. These concepts are the product of the agent’s social heritage and cognitive interests, so they are not a priori in the sense of being given absolutely: they are pragmatically a priori. They admit of alternatives and the choice among them rests on pragmatic considerations pertaining to cognitive success.

His 1932 Symbolic Logic presented his system of strict implication and a set of successively stronger modal logics, the S systems. He showed that there are many alternative systems of logic, each self-evident in its own way, a fact which undermines the traditional rationalistic view of metaphysical first principles as being logically undeniable. As a result, he concluded that the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical or pragmatic considerations.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Early Years
  3. Logical Investigations
  4. Mind and the World Order
  5. The Conversation with Positivism
  6. Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation
  7. Valuation and Rightness
  8. The Late Ethics
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Major Works by Lewis
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

Lewis's philosophy as a whole reveals a systematic unity in which logic, epistemology, value theory and ethics all take their place as forms of rational conduct in its broadest sense of self-directed agency. In his first major work, Mind and the World Order (MWO), published in 1929, Lewis put forward a position he called "conceptualistic pragmatism" according to which empirical knowledge depends upon a sensuous 'given', the constructive activity of a mind and a set of a priori concepts which the agent brings to, and thereby interprets, the given. These concepts are the product of the agent's social heritage and cognitive interests, so they are not a priori in the sense of being given absolutely: they are pragmatically a priori. They admit of alternatives and the choice among them rests on pragmatic considerations pertaining to cognitive success.

His 1932 Symbolic Logic presented his system of strict implication and a set of successively stronger modal logics, the S systems. He showed that there are many alternative systems of logic, each self- evident in its own way, a fact which undermines the traditional rationalistic view of metaphysical first principles as being logically undeniable. As a result, he concluded that the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical or pragmatic considerations.

After the War his work played an important part in giving shape to academic philosophy as a profession. His 1946 Carus Lectures, An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation (AKV) which represents a refinement of the doctrines of MWO and their extension to a theory of value, set the issues of postwar epistemology. The thoroughness of his discussion, and the technicalities of his writing were important models for postwar analytic philosophy. A student of Josiah Royce, William James and Ralph Barton Perry, a contemporary of Reichenbach, Carnap and the logical empiricists of the 30's and 40's, and the teacher of Quine, Frankena, Goodman, Chisholm, Firth and others, C.I. Lewis played a pivotal role in shaping the marriage between pragmatism and empiricism which has come to dominate much of current analytic philosophy.

After AKV, Lewis directed the final 20 years of his life to the foundation of ethics, giving numerous public lectures. He died in 1964 leaving a vast collection of unpublished manuscripts on ethical theory which are housed at the Stanford University Library.

2. The Early Years

Lewis was born on April 12, 1883, in relative poverty at Stoneham, Massachusetts. He enrolled in Harvard in 1902 , working part time as a tutor and a waiter, and received his B.A. degree three years later, taking an appointment to teach high school English in Quincy, Massachusetts. The following year he was appointed Instructor in English at the University of Colorado, moved to Boulder, and that winter married his high school sweetheart, Mabel Maxwell Graves. They stayed in Boulder for two years and in 1908 he enrolled in the PhD program, receiving his degree two years later in 1910, in part because financial concerns precluded a more leisurely pace. His thesis, The Place of Intuition in Knowledge prefigured important themes in his later work.

As an undergraduate, Lewis's principal influences were James and Royce. When he returned to Harvard as a graduate student, James had retired, and the absolute idealism of Royce and Bradley was under attack by the New Realism of Moore and Russell in Great Britain and of W.P. Montague and Ralph Barton Perry at Harvard. The debate between Royce and James over monism and pluralism had been replaced by a debate between Royce and Perry over realism and idealism. Lewis studied metaphysics with Royce, and he studied Kant and epistemology with Perry. The debate between Royce and Perry framed Lewis's dissertation and in it he attempted to forge a neo-Kantian middle road.

It is worth briefly discussing his dissertation because in many way it prefigures his later views. In his dissertation Lewis argued that the possibility of valid, justified, knowledge requires both givenness (or intuition) and the mind's legislative or constructive activity. Lewis used the egocentric predicament in a dialectical argument against both the realist and idealist solutions to the problem of knowledge. Against Perry's direct realism, he argued that what is known transcends what is present to the mind in the act of knowledge and that the real object is thus never given in consciousness; since knowledge requires that what is given to the mind be interpreted by our purposeful activity the real object of knowledge is made instead of given.

Against Royce, Lewis asserted the necessity of a given sensuous element that is neither a product of willing nor necessarily implicit in the cognitive aim of ideas. The mind's activity is not constitutive of the known object because it does not make the given. Its purpose is rather to understand, or interpret, the given by referring it to an object which is real in some category or another. To be real is a matter of classification and only future experience will confirm or disconfirm the correctness of our classification, but some classification of the given will necessarily be correct. Whatever is unreal is so only relative to a certain way of understanding it Relative to some other purpose of understanding it will be real; the contents of a dream, for example are unreal only relative to a misclassification of them as a veridical perception. All knowledge contains a given element which shapes possible interpretation but the object known also transcends present experience.

It is remarkable how many themes in his mature work are already mobilized in his dissertation. Lewis's solution to the problem of knowledge had both realist and idealist elements in an unstable equilibrium and his position would change several times over the next few years. Under the influence of Royce and Hume's skepticism, Lewis came to believe that no realist answer to the problem of knowledge could work, and only an idealist solution would suffice. "How could the given be intelligible to the mind if it were independent of its interpretive activity?" This is a question which Lewis would not solve to his satisfaction until much later when he read Peirce. There is no doubt, however, that Lewis saw that a realist of Perry's sort had no answer to it. At this point Lewis clearly had neither proof nor account of the relation of knowledge to independent reality. The synthesis of his dissertation had raised deep problems which were only to be answered by the mature system in MWO . "How can the given be intelligible if it is independent of the mind?" "If the mind does not shape or condition what is given to it how could valid knowledge be possible?" It seemed clear to Lewis that if justified knowledge were possible at all, then realism must be wrong. But idealism, as Lewis understood it, appealed to a necessary agreement between human will and the absolute in knowledge which was also unjustifiable.

3. Logical Investigations

Lewis received his PhD in 1910 but there were no jobs. This was a bitter disappointment for Lewis, who with a wife and small child, had hoped the financial difficulties of the past two years would be over. After a summer at his uncle's farm the Lewises returned to Cambridge where Lewis spent the year tutoring and serving as an assistant in Royce's logic class. Royce was one of America's premier logicians during the time that Lewis was studying at Harvard and he introduced Lewis to Volume 1 of Russell and Whitehead's Principia Mathematica which had just been published.

In the fall of 1911, Lewis went to the University of California at Berkeley as an instructor where, except for a stint in the army during World War I, he was to stay until his return to Harvard in 1920. During this period, Lewis worked primarily on epistemology and logic and, finding no logic texts available, was soon at work on a text on symbolic logic. This work would appear at the end of the war in 1918 as A Survey of Symbolic Logic the first history of the subject in English -- and would form the basis of his better known Symbolic Logic , written together with C. H. Langford and published in 1932. Lewis's work on logic was dictated in part by the need for a good text book and in part by objections to the paradoxes of material implication in Principia Mathematica and his desire to develop an account of inference more reflective of human reasoning. However, Lewis was still exercised by the problem of knowledge from his dissertation and was increasingly unhappy with the quasi-idealist solution he had explored there. In fact, Lewis's study of logic during this period was at least in part directed towards examining important idealist assumptions about logic, which he would come to reject.

To solve the problem of knowledge the idealist needed logical truth to be absolute, for if the categorial form of our constructive will could vary then we would have no reason to take our interpretations to be true of the world. Lewis would attack the idealist assumptions in four related ways. First, he would argue that the coherence of a system of propositions depends upon the consistency of the propositions with each other and not on their dependence upon a set of absolute or self-evident truths. Secondly, he argued that a system rich enough to capture the notion of a world, or system of facts, is necessarily pluralistic in the sense that it must contain elements which are logically independent of each other. Thirdly, he argued that the existence of alternative deductive systems completely undermines the rationalistic view that metaphysical first principles can be shown to be logically necessary through the argument of 'reaffirmation through denial' (where in the attempt to deny a logical principle we necessarily presuppose its truth). Finally, he concluded that given the existence of alternative systems of logic, the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical, pragmatic considerations.

Lewis's work in logic was also guided in part by concerns about Russell's choice of material implication as a paradigm of logical deduction. Lewis constructed his own logical calculus based on relations in intention and strict implication, which he saw as a more adequate model of actual inference. Material implication has the property that a false proposition implies everything and so argued Lewis it is useless as a model of real inference. What we want to know is what would follow from a proposition if it were true and for Lewis this amounts to saying that the real basis of the inference is the strict implication where 'A strictly implies B' means that 'The truth of A is inconsistent with the falsity of B.' Lewis saw his account of strict implication to have important consequences for metaphysics and for the normative in general. He argued that the line dividing propositions corroborated or refuted by logic alone (necessary or logically impossible propositions) from the class of empirical truths or falsehood was of first importance of the theory of knowledge. The categories of possible and impossible, contingent and necessary, consistent and inconsistent are all independent of material truth and are founded on logic itself.

In 1920 Lewis was invited to return to Harvard to take up a one year position as Lecturer in Philosophy and was to remain for over 30 years until his retirement in 1953. There Lewis was reintroduced to Peirce and the last piece of his account of knowledge would fall into place, THE PRAGMATIC a priori.

After Peirce's death Royce had arranged for the Peirce manuscripts to be brought to Harvard, and at the time of Lewis's appointment the department was concerned that the manuscript remains, consisting of thousands of pages of apparently unorganized material, be catalogued. Lewis was given the job and although the task of arranging and cataloguing the papers ultimately passed to others, the two years he spent on that task gave Lewis the final building blocks for his mature epistemological position which he would call conceptualistic pragmatism. Lewis would find in Peirce's "conceptual pragmatism," with its emphasis upon the instrumental and empirical significance of concepts rather than upon any non-absolute character of truth, a resonance with his logical investigations.

Lewis in effect would turn the idealist thesis that mind determined the structure of reality on its head without giving up the idealist view of the legislative power of the mind. The mind interprets the given by way of concepts: the real, ultimately, becomes a matter of criterial commitment. The mind does not thereby manufacture what is given to it, but meets the independent given with interpretive structures which it brings to the encounter. In his dissertation Lewis had argued that the possibility of valid, justified, knowledge requires both givenness and the mind's legislative or constructive activity. The epistemological view Lewis would now develop retained this basic structure but embedded it in a richer, psycho-biological model of inquiry and a more adequate account of the role of a priori concepts in knowledge. In the early 20's Lewis would publish two seminal articles, "A Pragmatic Conception of The a priori," and "The Pragmatic Element in Knowledge." These two papers laid out the core of Lewis's pragmatic theory of knowledge, which would be developed more richly in Mind and the World Order (MWO).

In "A Pragmatic Conception of the a priori," Lewis rejected traditional concepts of the a priori arguing that, "The thought which both rationalism and empiricism have missed is that there are principles, representing the initiative of mind, which impose upon experience no limitations whatever, but that such conceptions are still subject to alternation on pragmatic grounds when the expanding boundaries of experience reveal their felicity as intellectual instruments." What is important about an hypothesis is that it is a "concept" -- a purely logical meaning -- which can be brought to bear on experience. The concepts we formulate are in part determined by our pragmatic interests and in part by the nature of experience. Fundamental scientific laws are a priori because they order experience so that it can be investigated. The same is true of our more fundamental categorial notions. The given contains both the real and illusion, dream and fantasy. Our categorial concepts allow us to sort experience so that it can be interrogated. Thus the fact that we must fix our meanings before we can apply them productively in experience, is entirely compatible with their historical alteration or even abandonment.

In "The Pragmatic Element in Knowledge", Lewis extended his pragmatism about the a priori to the theory of knowledge. Here, following Peirce and Royce, he identifies three elements in knowledge which are separable only by analysis: the element of experience which is given to an agent, the structure of concepts with which the agent interprets what is given, and the agent's act of interpreting what is given by means of those concepts. The distinctively pragmatic character of this theory lies both in the fact that knowledge is activity or interpretation and that the concepts with which the mind interrogates experience reflect fallible and revisable commitments to future experiential consequences. Knowledge is an interpretation of the experiential significance for an agent with certain interests of what is given in experience; a significance testable by its consequences for action.

A priori truth is independent of experience because it is purely analytic of our concepts and can dictate nothing to the given. The formal sciences depend on nothing which is empirically given, depending purely on logical analysis for their content. So a priori truth is not assertive of fact but is instead definitive. There is logical order arising from our definitions in all knowledge. Ordinarily we do not separate out this logical order, but it is always possible to do so, and it is this element which minds must have in common if they are to understand each other. As Lewis puts it, "At the end of an hour which feels very long to you and short to me, we can meet by agreement, because our common understanding of that hour is not a feeling of tedium or vivacity, but means sixty minutes, one round of the clock...". In short, shared concepts do not depend upon the identity of sense feeling, but in their objective significance for action.

The concept, the purely logical pattern of meaning, is an abstraction from the richness of actual experience. It represents what the mind brings to experience in the act of interpretation. The other element, that which the mind finds , or what is independent of thought, is the given. The given is also an abstraction, but it cannot be expressed in language because language implies concepts and because the given is that aspect of experience which concepts do not convey. Knowledge is the significance which experience has for possible action and the further experience to which such action would lead.

4. Mind and the World Order

Lewis first major book, Mind and the World Order (MWO) develops these results in three principal theses: first, a priori truth is definitive and offers criteria by means of which experience can be discriminated; second, the application of concepts to any particular experience is hypothetical and the choice of conceptual system meets pragmatic needs; and third, the susceptibility of experience to conceptual interpretation requires no particular metaphysical assumption about the conformity of experience to the mind or its categories. These principles allow Lewis to present the traditional problem of knowledge as resting on a mistake. There is no contradiction between the relativity of knowledge to the knowing mind and the independence of its object. The assumption that there is, is the product of Cartesian representationalism, the 'copy theory' of thought, in which knowledge of an object is taken to be qualitative coincidence between the idea in the mind and the external real object. For Lewis knowledge does not copy anything but concerns the relation between this experience and other possible experiences of which this experience is a sign. Knowledge is expressible not because we share the same data of sense but because we share concepts and categorial commitments.

All knowledge is conceptual; the given, having no conceptual structure of its own, is not even a possible object of knowledge. Foundationalism of the classical empiricist sort is thus directly precluded. Lewis's task for MWO is in effect a pragmatic solution to Hume's problem of induction: an account of the order we bring to experience which renders knowledge possible but makes no appeal to anything lying outside of experience. Prefiguring contemporary externalist accounts of representation, Lewis argues that both representative realism and phenomenalism are incoherent. Knowledge as correct interpretation is independent of whether the phenomenal character of experience is a "likeness" of the real object known, because the phenomenal character of experience only receives its function as a sign from its conceptual interpretation, that is, from its significance for future experience and action. The question of the validity of knowledge claims is thus for Lewis fundamentally the question of the normative significance of our empirical assessments for action.

Lewis argued that our spontaneous interpretation of experience by way of concepts that have objective significance for future experience constitutes a kind of diagnosis of appearance . If we could not recognize a sensuous content in our classification of it with qualitatively similar ones which have acquired predictive significance in the past, interpretation would be impossible. Despite the fact that such recognition is spontaneous and unconsidered it has the logical character of a generalization. To recognize an object -- "this is a round penny" -- is to make a fallible empirical claim, but to recognize the appearance is to classify it with other qualitatively similar appearances. The basis of the empirical judgment lies in the fact that past instances of such classification have been successful. Our empirical knowledge claims are dependent for their justification upon this body of conceptual interpretations in two ways. First, the world, in the form of future events implicitly predicted (or not) by our empirical judgments, will confirm or disconfirm those judgments: all empirical knowledge is thus merely probable. But secondly, the classification of immediate apprehensions by way of concepts justifying particular empirical judgments is itself generalization even when those concepts have come to function as a criterion of sense meaning. Concepts become criteria of classification because they allow us to make empirically valid judgments, and because they fit usefully in the larger structure of our concepts.

This structure, looked at apart from experience is an a priori system of concepts. The application of one of its constituent concepts to any particular is a matter of probability but the question of applying the system in general is a matter of the choice of an abstract system and can only be determined by pragmatic considerations. The implications of a concept within a system become criteria of its applicability in that system. If later experience does not accord with the logical implications of our application of a concept to a particular, we will withdraw the application of the concept. Persistent failure of individual concepts to apply fruitfully to experience will lead us to readjust the system as a whole. Our conceptual interpretations form a hierarchy in which some are more fundamental than others; abandoning them will have more radical consequences than abandoning others. Lewis's account of inquiry offers both a non-metaphysical account of induction and an early version of the so called 'theory-ladenness of observation terms'. There is no need for synthetic a priori or metaphysical truths to bridge the gap between abstract concepts in the mind and the reality presented in experience. Lewis offers a kind of 'Kantian deduction of the categories' providing a pragmatic vindication of induction but without Kant's assumption that experience is limited by the modes of intuition and fixed forms of thought. Without a system of conceptual interpretation, no experience is possible, but which system of interpretation we use is a matter of choice and what we experience is given to us by reality. The importance of the given in this story is its independence . Our conceptual system can at best specify a system of possible worlds; within it the actual is not to be deduced but acknowledged. In short, Lewis's theory of knowledge in MWO is a pragmatic theory of inquiry which combines rationalist and naturalistic elements to make knowledge of the real both fallible and progressive without recourse to transcendental guarantees.

5. The Conversation with Positivism

MWO was published in 1929 during a time of tragedy for Lewis and his family. MWO was very well received and Lewis's career was now secure; he was elected to the American Academy of Arts and Sciences in May of 1929 and made a full professor at Harvard in 1930. But his daughter died that year after two years of a mysterious ailment and a few years later Lewis suffered a heart attack due to overwork. Despite life's trials, the period between MWO and AKV was a period of intellectual expansion for Lewis. Lewis began to explore the consequences of his views for value theory and ethics. At the same time his logical interests shifted. While technical issues continued to occupy his attention for the next few years, largely in the form of replies to responses to his work in Symbolic Logic , his thinking shifted decisively away from technicalities and towards the experiential structure of meaning and its relation to value and knowledge. There were several reasons for this.

The period was a time of decisive change in philosophy in America generally. The influx of British and German philosophy into the United States during the thirties and the increasing professionalization of the universities, posed deep and ambiguous problems for American philosophers with a naturalistic or pragmatic orientation, and for Lewis in particular. Logical empiricism, with its emphasis on scientific models of knowledge and on the logical analysis of meaning claims was emerging as the most pervasive tendency in American philosophy in the thirties and forties, and Lewis was strongly identified with that movement. But Lewis was never completely comfortable in this company. For Lewis, experience was always at the center of the cognitive enterprise. The rapid abandonment of experiential analysis in favor of physicalism by the major positivists and their rejection of value as lacking cognitive significance both struck him as particularly unfortunate. Indeed his own deepening conversation with the pragmatic tradition led him in the opposite direction. It is only within experience that anything could have significance for anything, and Lewis came to see that rather than lacking cognitive significance, value is one way of representing the significance which knowledge has for future conduct. Attempting to work out these convictions led him to reflect on the differences between pragmatism and positivism, and to begin to investigate the cognitive structure of value experiences.

The pragmatist, Lewis holds, is committed to the Peircean pragmatic test of significance. But, as he notes in his 1930 essay, "Pragmatism and Current Thought," this dictum can be taken in either of two directions. On the one hand, its emphasis on experience could be developed in a psychologistic direction and promote a form of subjectivism. On the other, the fact that the Peircean test limits meaning to that which makes a verifiable difference in experience takes it in the direction which he developed in MWO, to a view of concepts as abstractions in which "the immediate is precisely that element which must be left out." But this claim must be correctly understood. An operational account of concepts empties them only of what is ineffable in experience. "If your hours are felt as twice as long as mine, your pounds twice as heavy, that makes no difference, which can be tested, in our assignment of physical properties to things." A concept is thus merely a relational pattern. But it does not follow from this that the world as it is experienced is thrown out the window. "In one sense that of connotation a concept strictly comprises nothing but an abstract configuration of relations. In another sense its denotation or empirical application this meaning is vested in a process which characteristically begins with something given and ends with something done in the operation which translates a presented datum into an instrument of prediction and control." Knowledge is a matter of two moments, beginning and ending in experience although it does not end in the same experience in which it begins. Knowledge of something requires that the experience which is anticipated or envisaged as verifying it is actually met with. Thus, the appeal to an operational definition or test of verifiability as the empirical meaning of a statement is, for the pragmatist, the requirement that the speaker know how to apply or refuse to apply the statement in question and to trace its consequences in the case of presented or imagined situations.

In his 1933 presidential address to the American Philosophical Association, "Experience and Meaning", Lewis dealt with the question of verifiable significance in a very general way emphasizing both the points of agreement and difference between pragmatism and logical positivism. Lewis framed the discussion of meaning in terms of the distinction between immediacy and transcendence, sketching arguments against both phenomenalism and representational realism. What remains, the third way, is a view of meaning common to absolute idealism, logical positivism and pragmatism. Meaning is a relation of verifiability or signification between present and possible future experience.

In "Logical Positivism and Pragmatism", Lewis compared his pragmatic conception of empirical meaning with the verificationism of logical positivism in a sharply critical way. Both movements, he argued, are forms of empiricism and hold conceptions of empirical meaning as verifiable ultimately by reference to empirical eventualities. The pragmatic conception of meaning looks superficially very much like the logical- positivist theory of verification despite its different formulation and its focus on action. But, argues Lewis, there is a deep difference. Whereas the pragmatic account rests meaning ultimately upon conceivable experience, the positivist account logicizes the relation. Lewis's complaint is that this results in a conception of meaning which omits precisely what a pragmatist would count as the empirical meaning. Specifying which observation sentences are consequences of a given sentence helps us know the empirical meaning of a sentences only if the observation sentences themselves have an already understood empirical meaning in terms of the specific qualities of experience to which the observations predicates of the statement apply. Thus for Lewis the logical positivist fails to distinguish between linguistic meaning, which concerns logical relations with other terms, and empirical meaning, which concerns the relation expressions have to what may be given in experience, and as a result, leaves out precisely the thing which actually confirms a statement, namely the content of experience.

The emphasis on the experience of the knower points to a yet larger contrast between positivism and pragmatism regarding the difference between judgments of value and judgments of fact. Lewis was entirely opposed to the positivist conception of value statements as devoid of cognitive content, as merely expressive. For the pragmatist all judgments are, implicitly, judgments of value. Lewis would develop both the conception of sense meaning and the thesis that valuation is a form of empirical cognition in AKV .

6. Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation

In 1946 The Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation (AKV) was published, and Lewis was awarded the Edgar Pierce Professorship at Harvard, the chair which had been held by Perry and would be held by Quine after Lewis. AKV was the most widely discussed book of its day.

The pragmatic psycho-biological model of inquiry which Lewis adopted from Peirce and James is even more visibly a part of AKV than it was in MWO. Knowledge, action and evaluation are essentially connected animal adaptive responses. Cognition, as a vital function, is a response to the significance which items in an organism's experiential environment have for that organism. Any psychological attitude which carries cognitive significance as a response will exhibit some value character of utility or disutility which can ground the correctness or incorrectness of that response as knowledge. Cognitively guided behavior is a kind of adaptive response, and the correctness of behavior guiding experience, to the extent that it carries cognitive significance, depends simply on whether the expectations lodged in it come about as the result of action. Meaning, in this sense is anticipation of further experience associated with present content and the truth of it concerns the verifiability of expected consequences of action. It is because of this that sense-apprehension is basic and underlies other forms of empirical cognition. Perceptual cognition involves a sign-function connecting present experience and possible future eventualities grounded in some mode of action which, pervading the experience in its immediacy, gives it its cognitive content.

The signifying character of the expectancies lodged in immediate experience is enormously expanded by the web of concepts we inherit as language users. Lewis did not, however, identify meaning with linguistic signs. Linguistic signs are secondary to something more basic in our experience which we share with animals generally and which occurs when something within our experience stands for something else as a sign. When the cat comes running because she hears you opening a can and takes it as a sign of dinner, she is responding to the meaning of her experience. While this meaning is independent of whether or not you are opening a can of cat food her expectation will be confirmed if the can contains cat food and disconfirmed if it doesn't.

Meaning in this sense of empirical significance could only be available to a creature who can act in anticipation of events to be realized or avoided. Accordingly, the possible is epistemologically prior to the actual. Only an agent, for whom experience could have anticipatory significance, could have a concept of objective reality as that which is possible to verify or change. In addition to meaning as empirical significance Lewis distinguished the kind of meaning involved in the apprehension of our concepts. A definition represents a mode of classification, and although alternative modes of classification can be more or less useful, classification cannot be determined by that which is to be classified. Knowledge of meanings in this sense is analytic.

In AKV, Lewis distinguishes between four modes of meaning: (1) the denotation or extension of a term is the class of actual things to which the terms applies; (2) the comprehension of a term is the class of all possible things to which the term would correctly apply; (3) the signification of a term is the character of things the presence or absence of which determines the comprehension of the term; (4) the intension of a term is the conjunction of all the other terms which must be correctly applicable to anything to which the term correctly applies. A proposition is a term capable of signifying a state of affairs; it comprehends any possible world which would contain the state of affairs it signifies. The intension of a proposition includes whatever the proposition entails and thus comprises whatever must be true of any possible world for that proposition to be true of it.

Intentional and denotational modes of meaning are two aspects of cognitive apprehension in general, the denotational being that aspect of apprehension which, given our classifications, is dependent upon how experience turns out, and the intentional being that aspect of apprehension which reflects the classifications or definitions we have made and is thus independent of experience. Our choice of classification is essentially pragmatic, however, so what may count as an empirical matter in one context may count legislatively in another, generalizations may be corrected by future experience and our definitions replaced on the grounds of inadequacy. The analytic element in knowledge is indispensable because unless our intensions are fixed our terms have no denotation, but nothing determines how we shall fix our intensions save the superior utility of one set of terms over others.

While intensional meaning is primary for him, Lewis distinguishes between two different ways in which we can think of it. First, linguistic meaning is intension as constituted by the pattern of definitions of our terms. Secondly, sense meaning is intension as the criterion in terms of sense by which the application of terms to experience is determined. Sense meaning is more fundamental. Learning involves the extension of generalizations to unobserved cases and correlatively recognizing in new experiences the correct applicability of our terms. The sense meaning of a term is our criterion for applying the term correctly. In a thought experiment anticipating Searle's "Chinese Room," Lewis imagines a person who somehow learns Arabic using only an Arabic dictionary thus learning all the linguistic patterns in the language. This person would grasp the linguistic meanings of all the terms in Arabic but might nonetheless not know the meaning of any of the terms in the sense of knowing their application to the world. The language would remain a meaningless and arbitrary system of syntactic relationships. Linguistic meaning is nonetheless central in communication because what can be shared is conceptual structure. Understanding between two minds depends not on postulated identity of imagery or sensation but on shared definitions and concepts.

The validation of empirical knowledge has two dimensions, its verification and its justification. Verification is predictive and formulates our expectations for verification or falsification. Justification looks to the rational credibility of those expectations prior to their verification. In the acquisition of knowledge these dimensions support each other. The warrant which our present beliefs have is shaped by the history of past verifications of similar beliefs. Reflection on the warranted expectancies in our present beliefs leads us to formulate new generalizations and normative principles we can subject to tests. The common stock of concepts in our language embeds such principles and empirical generalizations in the intensions of terms. As a result our use of terms decisively shapes what is warranted and verifiable for us.

Lewis distinguishes between three classes of empirical statements. First, there are what he calls expressive statements which attempt to express what is presently given in experience. An ordinary perceptual judgment, say seeing my cat by the fridge, outstrips what is presently evident. This added content is carried by the intensions of the concepts in the judgment insofar as they convey the expectancies found in the experience. These expectancies, although partly a function of past learning and knowledge of the intension of terms, are simply given in the experience, they are the part we do not invent and cannot change but merely find. Lewis suggests that we can use language expressively to capture this presentational content by stripping our meaning of its ordinary implication of objective content. Secondly, there are statements which formulate predictions. The judgment that if I do action A the outcome will include E, where E indicates an aspect of experience expressively characterized, is one which can be completely verified by putting it to the test. Upon acting the content E will either be given or it will not. Lewis calls empirical judgments of this sort terminating judgments. Finally, there are judgments which assert the actuality of some state of affairs. Although they can be rendered increasingly probable by tests, no set of eventualities envisioned can exhaust their significance. Lewis calls these judgments non-terminating because there are indefinitely many further tests which could, theoretically speaking, falsify the prediction and any actual verification can be no more than partial.

The ground of empirical judgments is past experience of like cases. At bottom those experiences have a warrant-producing character for a particular response because of the directly apprehended qualitative character of the signal combined with the expectations due to similar experiences in the past. In short, an empirical judgment is justified by its relation to past experiences of like cases. The warrant producing character of those experiences for a particular judgment depends upon the recognition of the presentation as classifiable with other qualitatively similar appearances as significant of future experience, and the character of the passages of experience attending past instances of the judgment. Epistemic warrant at its bottom level is the animal's recognition of future objectivity lodged in present experience; present experience is a sign of experience to come. A multi-storied interpretive structure of concepts is built upon this adaptive responsiveness. Concepts become criteria of classification because they allow us to make empirically valid judgments, and because they fit usefully in the larger structure of our concepts. The structure, viewed apart from experience, is an a priori system of concepts, but looked at in terms of experience it is a network of sense meanings. The concept of probability plays a more prominent role in AKV than it does in MWO, but it is not a role of a different kind.

Perceptual knowledge has two aspects: the givenness of the experience and the objective interpretation which, in light of past experience, we put on it. But these are both abstractions and only distinguishable by analysis. What is given in experience as spontaneously arising expectancies is already conceptually structured, to recognize the given is to classify it with qualitatively similar cases and that recognition, although spontaneous, has the logical character as a generalization. The system of concepts within which our judgments are formulated and the pyramidal structure of empirical beliefs which intend a set of possible worlds of which ours is but one, by themselves suggest a coherence theory of justification. But here, as in MWO, Lewis resists this idealist alternative. Lewis takes the given to be essential for a series of interrelated reasons. Mere coherence of a system of statements does not even give meaning; the student of Arabic mentioned earlier does not know what any of the terms mean and cannot even use a statement to express a judgment. The given thus plays the role of fixing what beliefs mean because it lodges the actual world among the various possible worlds which are compatible with my knowledge: whichever world I am in it is this one. A merely hypothetical system of congruent and consistent statements could be fabricated out of whole cloth, as a novelist does, but however richly developed, the congruence and coherence of the system would be no evidence of fact at all. Independently given facts are indispensable and they are the actually given expectancies whose objective intent we then can evaluate for their mutual congruence and coherence.

Lewis's emphasis on the given has been taken by many contemporary philosophers to be an instance of classical foundationalism. As we saw in the discussion of MWO Lewis considered the very idea of sense data to be incoherent. There is, however, a debate about whether his views changed between that book and AKV. Christopher Gowans (in "Two Concepts of the Given in C.I. Lewis, Realism and Foundationalism") has argued that Lewis had two different conceptions of the given but failed to recognize the difference between them. On this view, while Lewis was an anti-foundationalist in MWO he embraced foundationalism in AKV and his later thinking. Determining Lewis's position is, of course, a matter of interpretation. I think that a non-foundationalist position is dictated by the larger structure of his thought. He was certainly not a foundationalist in the British empiricist sense of the word.

7. Valuation and Rightness

Lewis rejected the "scandal" of emotivism and noncognitivism and directed much of his late thinking to two tasks: demonstrating that valuation is a species of empirical knowledge and establishing that there are valid nonrepudiable imperatives or principles of rightness. Lewis's acceptance of the psycho-biological model of inquiry and it's emphasis on the evolutionary and biological ground of cognition in animal adaptive response, committed him to the ineliminability of value in knowledge. Inquiry directed towards epistemic goals is, he argued, no less a species of conduct than practical and moral inquiry. Conduct of any sort will be directed towards ends appropriate to it and in light of which both its success can be measured and its aim be critiqued as reasonable or unreasonable. Lewis argued that evaluations are a form of empirical knowledge no different fundamentally from other forms of empirical knowledge regarding the determination of their truth or falsity, or of their validity or justification.

Much of Lewis's discussion takes the form of an analysis of the concepts surrounding rational agency. Purposeful activity intrinsically involves rational cognitive appraisal. Action is behavior which is deliberate in the sense of being subject to critique and alterable upon reflection. It is behavior for the sake of realizing something to which a positive value is ascribed. He characterizes an action as sensible just in case the result or its intent, is ascribed comparative value. The purpose of an act, by which he means that part of the intent of an act for the sake of which it is adopted, can also be said to be sensible because what is purposed is something to which comparative value is ascribed. An act is successful in the circumstance that it is adopted for a sensible purpose which is realized in the result.

The verification of success will depend upon the purpose for which the act is done. The success of an action aimed at an enjoyable experience can be decisively verified if that experience is attained, but typically the purpose of an act will be to bring about a state of affairs whose value-consequences extend into the future and will thus be affected by other states of affairs, and so the success of the act may never be fully verified. In addition, an act may fail of its purpose in two ways: the expected result may fail to follow or it may be realized but fail to have the value ascribed to it.

Just as there are two aspects to the validation of empirical belief, verification and justification, Lewis distinguishes the success (or verification) of an action from its practical justification, which is the character belonging to a belief just in case its intent is an expectation which is a warranted empirical belief. Given these distinctions, Lewis argues that unless values were truth-apt in the sense of being genuine empirical cognitions capable of confirmation or disconfirmation, no intention or purpose could be serious and hence no action could be justified or attain success. The enterprise of human life can only prosper, he says, if there are value judgments which are true. Those who deny it fall into a kind of practical contradiction similar to that of Epimenides the Cretan who said that all Cretans are liars. Making a judgment, framing an argument, and deciding to take an action, are all activities which involve bringing to bear cognitive criteria of classification, inference and cogency on the matter at hand. Thinking is an activity which presupposes selective and intelligent choice concerning the path of thought. Repudiation of the rational imperativeness of so selectively choosing is thus nothing less than a repudiation of the cognitive aim of thinking. All the different forms of imperatives, the epistemic and logical imperatives, the technical, prudential and moral imperatives, are of a piece: they are principles of right intellectual conduct, in short, principles of intelligent practice. The notions of correctness, conduct, objectivity and reality are all forged within the system of communal practices which give these concepts ground. Our conceptual framework is not merely a set of common concepts but also a set of communal norms regulating our conduct. We can reject these norms only by repudiating our conceptual framework, but there is no other ground of rational choice which could provide a warrant for an act of repudiation, so that the act of repudiating norms tacitly presupposes the warrant which norms provide. The skeptic's own claims constitute a reductio ad absurdum against his position.

As we saw, Lewis distinguished between three classes of empirical statement, expressive, terminating and non-terminating statements. Since valuation is a species of empirical knowledge Lewis distinguishes between three kinds of value-predications. First, there are expressive statements of found value quality as directly experienced. Such predications require no verification as they make no claim which could be subjected to test. Secondly, there are terminating evaluations which predict the success of an action aimed at some value experience as result. These can be put to test by so acting and thus are directly verifiable. Finally there are non-terminating evaluations which ascribe an objective value property to an object or state of affairs. Like any other judgment of objective empirical fact such claims are always fallible though some may attain practical certainty.

Since the aim of sensible action is the realization of some positive value in experience, only what is immediately valuable can be valuable for its own sake or intrinsically valuable. Extrinsic values divide into values which are instrumental for some thing else and values found to be inherent in objects, situations or states of affairs. Value, Lewis argues, is not a kind of quality but a dimension-like orientational mode pervading all experience. To live and to act is necessarily to be subject to imperatives, to recognize the validity of norms. The good which we seek in action is not this or that presently given value experience but a life which is good on the whole. That is something which cannot be immediately disclosed in present experience but can only be comprehended by some imaginative or synthetic envisagement of its on- the-whole quality. We are subject to imperatives because future possibilities are present in our experience only as signs of the significance which that experience has for the future if we decide to act one way rather than another. Since we are free to act or not we must move ourselves in accordance with the directive import of our experience to realize future goods. Life is not an aggregate of separate moments but a synthetic whole in which no single experience momentarily given says the last word about itself: each moment has its own fixed and unalterable character but the significance of that character for the whole, like the significance of a note within a piece of music, depends upon the character of other experiences to which it stands in relation. The value assessment of experiential wholes can never be directly certain nor decisively verified in any experience because what is to be assessed is a whole of experiences as it is experienced, and there is no moment in which this experiential whole is present. The value of experiential wholes thus essentially involves memory and narrative interpretation.

8. The Late Ethics

A discussion of Lewis's philosophy would not be complete without a discussion of his late work in ethics. Lewis's ethics, toward which the whole of his mature philosophical work aimed, is a richly developed foundation for a common sense reflective morality, broadly within the American pragmatic naturalistic tradition. No one can cogently repudiate the ethical task and it is not the special mission of any discipline. At the center of Lewis's theory of practical reason is the rational imperative. While a naturalist with respect to values, he held practical thinking in all its forms to rest for its cogency on categorically valid principles of right. Ethics, epistemology and logic are all inquiries into species of right conduct. They are kinds of thinking, subject to our deliberate self-government and thus to normative critique, and as a consequence they are all forms of practical reason.

Under the influence of Kant, he held that imperatives are rational constraints put on our thinking by our nature as rational beings. He offered several arguments including a pragmatic 'Kantian deduction' of the principles of practice, arguing that without universally valid principles of practice, our experience of ourselves as agents would be impossible. He also offered a reductio ad absurdum against the skeptic. The denial of moral imperatives is pragmatically incoherent because it in effect attempts to mount a valid argument to the conclusion that there is no such thing as validity in argument; the skeptic's attempt to deny the universal validity of such imperatives involves him in what Lewis called a pragmatic contradiction and leads by a reductio ad absurdum to the confirmation of their validity. By implicitly asking us to weigh and consider his reasons, the skeptic appeals to reasons and argument as things which should constrain us in our beliefs and decisions, whether we like it or not and thus acknowledges their force in his practice. Imperatives are not arbitrary commands or recommendations to the self; they are directly and cognitively present in the agent's experience.

Rational imperatives must underlie all forms of rational self-regulation, of which ethics proper is only one department. Arguing, concluding, believing are also forms of self-governed conduct and it is to these forms that his argument first turns. Experience itself is for Lewis dynamically shaped by our classifications and judgments; as a temporal process its present moments are pervaded by implicit judgments, expectations and valuations, grounded in past expectations and confirmations. Permeated with value and active assessment, experience is a weave of givenness and conduct, of doing and suffering. Value qualities are verifiably found in experience; objective valuations are both fallible and corrigible. They are judgments which reflect the justified expectation of good (or unfavorable) consequences on the assumption of actions envisaged. Accordingly, the evaluative ought the rational imperative is at the heart of human experience. At the beginning his 1954 Woodbridge Lectures, as The Ground and Nature of the Right , he argues "To say that a thing is right is simply to characterize it as representing the desiderated commitment of choice in any situation calling for deliberate decision. What is right is thus the question of all questions; and the distinction of right and wrong extends to every topic or reflection and to all that human self-determination of act or attitude may affect."

Despite the critical priority of the right it is in the service of the good; and Lewis's account of both reflects a single commitment to the pragmatic structure of inquiry. Ethics grows out of the fact that human beings are active creatures who enter into the process of reality in order to change it. We are also social creatures whose experience and needs are taken up thematically in the categories and organized practices which make up our social inheritance. For Lewis both what is judged justifiably to be good and what ways of achieving it are validly imperative are fallibly grounded in human experience; skepticism about either the right or the good is ultimately a failure to acknowledge that fact. Since we are endowed with the capacity to do by choosing we are obligated to exercise it. We must decide even if we choose to do nothing, and the world will be different depending on how we decide

To say that human beings are self-conscious and self-governing creatures means, for Lewis, that they perceive their environment in terms of predictively hypothetical imperatives between which they are able to choose. Beliefs and imperatives are thus only modally distinct; they contain the same information. What Lewis calls the "Law of Objectivity" is governing oneself by the advice of cognition, in contravention if necessary to our impulses and inclination. Directives of doing, determined by the good or bad results of conforming to them, fall into various modes, principally the technical, the prudential and the moral and the logical. The imperative force of technical rules presumes as antecedently determined some class of ends; they justify actions only on the assumption of the justification of those ends. The rules of technique are thus hypothetical imperatives. By contrast, the rules of the critique of consistence and cogency, of prudence and of the moral are non-repudiable; they are categorical.

In his final years Lewis worked on a book on the foundations of ethics. It is clear from his manuscripts and letters that the ethics book occupied Lewis's attention in the early forties and for the rest of his life. While it is difficult to understand why Lewis was unable to work the material into a form which satisfied him, I think that it had come to have an importance in his mind, a finality, which combined with his declining health, prevented a final satisfactory version being written for he continued to work on his ethics book writing almost daily until his death in February of 1964.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Major Works by Lewis

  • Lewis, C.I., 1929. Mind and The World Order: an Outline of a Theory of Knowledge . Charles Scribner's Sons, New York, 1929, reprinted in paperback by Dover Publications, Inc. New York, 1956.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1932a. Symbolic Logic (with C.H. Langford). New York: The Appleton-Century Company, 1932 pp. xii +506, reprinted in paperback by New York: Dover Publications, 1951.
  • Lewis,C. I., 1946. An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation , (The Paul Carus Lectures, Series 8, 1946) Open Court, La Salle, 1946.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1955a. The Ground and Nature of the Right , The Woodbridge Lectures, V, delivered at Columbia University in November 1954, New York, Columbia University Press, 1955.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1957a. Our Social Inheritance , Mahlon Powell Lectures at University of Indiana, 1956, Bloomington, Indiana, Indiana University Press, 1957.
  • Collected Papers of Clarence Irving Lewis , ed. John D. Goheen and John L. Mothershead, Jr., Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1970.
    • Includes most of Lewis's most important articles.
  • Values and Imperatives, Studies in Ethics , ed. John Lange, Stanford University Press, Stanford, California, 1969.
    • Includes a number of Lewis's late, unpublished talks on ethics.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Dayton, Eric. AC I Lewis And The Given@, Transactions of the Charles S . Peirce Society , 31(2), Spr 1995, pp. 254-284.
  • Flower, Elizabeth and Murphey, Murray G. A History of Philosophy in America , New York, G.P. Putnam's Sons, 1977, Chapter 15. pp.892-958.
  • Gowans, Christopher W. ATwo Concepts Of The Given In C I Lewis: Realism And Foundationalism@. The Journal of the History of Philosophy , 27(4), 1989, pp. 573-590.
  • Haack, Susan. "C I Lewis" In American Philosophy , Singer, Marcus G (Ed), Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1986, pp. 215-238.
  • Hill, Thomas English. Contemporary Theories of Knowledge , The Ronald Press Co., New York, 1961, chapter 12, pp. 362-387.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. The Rise of American Philosophy, New Haven, Yale University Press, 1977, chapter 28, pp. 533-562.
  • Reck, Andrew J. The New American Philosophers , Louisiana State University Press, Baton Rouge, 1968, pp. 3-43.
  • Rosenthal, Sandra B. The Pragmatic a priori: Study In The Epistemology Of C I Lewis . St Louis, Green, 1976.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur (Ed). The Philosophy Of C I Lewis . La Salle Il Open Court, 1968.
  • Thayer, H S. Meaning And Action: A Critical History Of Pragmatism. Indianapolis Bobbs-Merrill, 1968, chapter 4, pp.205-231.


Author Information

Eric Dayton
University of Saskatchewan

George Herbert Mead (1863—1931)

MeadGeorge Herbert Mead is a major figure in the history of American philosophy, one of the founders of Pragmatism along with Peirce, James, Tufts, and Dewey. He published numerous papers during his lifetime and, following his death, several of his students produced four books in his name from Mead's unpublished (and even unfinished) notes and manuscripts, from students' notes, and from stenographic records of some of his courses at the University of Chicago. Through his teaching, writing, and posthumous publications, Mead has exercised a significant influence in 20th century social theory, among both philosophers and social scientists. In particular, Mead's theory of the emergence of mind and self out of the social process of significant communication has become the foundation of the symbolic interactionist school of sociology and social psychology. In addition to his well- known and widely appreciated social philosophy, Mead's thought includes significant contributions to the philosophy of nature, the philosophy of science, philosophical anthropology, the philosophy of history, and process philosophy. Both John Dewey and Alfred North Whitehead considered Mead a thinker of the highest order.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Social Theory
    1. Communication and Mind
    2. Action
    3. Self and Other
  4. The Temporal Structure of Human Existence
  5. Perception and Reflection: Mead's Theory of Perspectives
  6. Philosophy of History
    1. The Nature of History
    2. History and Self-Consciousness
    3. History and the Idea of the Future
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

George Herbert Mead was born in South Hadley, Massachusetts, on February 27, 1863, and he died in Chicago, Illinois, on April 26, 1931. He was the second child of Hiram Mead (d. 1881), a Congregationalist minister and pastor of the South Hadley Congregational Church, and Elizabeth Storrs Billings (1832-1917). George Herbert's older sister, Alice, was born in 1859. In 1870, the family moved to Oberlin, Ohio, where Hiram Mead became professor of homiletics at the Oberlin Theological Seminary, a position he held until his death in 1881. After her husband's death, Elizabeth Storrs Billings Mead taught for two years at Oberlin College and subsequently, from 1890 to 1900, served as president of Mount Holyoke College in South Hadley, Massachusetts.

George Herbert Mead entered Oberlin College in 1879 at the age of sixteen and graduated with a BA degree in 1883. While at Oberlin, Mead and his best friend, Henry Northrup Castle, became enthusiastic students of literature, poetry, and history, and staunch opponents of supernaturalism. In literature, Mead was especially interested in Wordsworth, Shelley, Carlyle, Shakespeare, Keats, and Milton; and in history, he concentrated on the writings of Macauley, Buckle, and Motley. Mead published an article on Charles Lamb in the 1882-3 issue of the Oberlin Review (15-16).

Upon graduating from Oberlin in 1883, Mead took a grade school teaching job, which, however, lasted only four months. Mead was let go because of the way in which he handled discipline problems: he would simply dismiss uninterested and disruptive students from his class and send them home.

From the end of 1883 through the summer of 1887, Mead was a surveyor with the Wisconsin Central Rail Road Company. He worked on the project that resulted in the eleven- hundred mile railroad line that ran from Minneapolis, Minnesota, to Moose Jaw, Saskatchewan, and which connected there with the Canadian Pacific railroad line.

Mead earned his MA degree in philosophy at Harvard University during the 1887-1888 academic year. While majoring in philosophy, he also studied psychology, Greek, Latin, German, and French. Among his philosophy professors were George H. Palmer (1842-1933) and Josiah Royce (1855-1916). During this time, Mead was most influenced by Royce's Romanticism and idealism.

Since Mead was later to become one of the major figures in the American Pragmatist movement, it is interesting that, while at Harvard, he did not study under William James (1842-1910) (although he lived in James's home as tutor to the James children).

In the summer of 1888, Mead's friend, Henry Castle and his sister, Helen, had traveled to Europe and had settled temporarily in Leipzig, Germany. Later, in the early fall of 1888, Mead, too, went to Leipzig in order to pursue a Ph.D. degree in philosophy and physiological psychology. During the 1888-1889 academic year at the University of Leipzig, Mead became strongly interested in Darwinism and studied with Wilhelm Wundt (1832-1920) and G. Stanley Hall (1844-1924) (two major founders of experimental psychology). On Hall's recommendation, Mead transferred to the University of Berlin in the spring of 1889, where he concentrated on the study of physiological psychology and economic theory.

While Mead and his friends, the Castles, were staying in Leipzig, a romance between Mead and Helen Castle developed, and they were subsequently married in Berlin on October 1, 1891. Prior to George and Helen's marriage, Henry Castle had married Frieda Stechner of Leipzig, and Henry and his bride had returned to Cambridge, Massachusetts, where Henry continued his studies in law at Harvard.

Mead's work on his Ph.D. degree was interrupted in the spring of 1891 by the offer of an instructorship in philosophy and psychology at the University of Michigan. This was to replace James Hayden Tufts (1862-1942), who was leaving Michigan in order to complete his Ph.D. degree at the University of Freiburg. Mead took the job and never thereafter resumed his own Ph.D. studies

Mead worked at the University of Michigan from the fall of 1891 through the spring of 1894. He taught both philosophy and psychology. At Michigan, he became acquainted with and influenced by the work of sociologist Charles Horton Cooley (1864-1929), psychologist Alfred Lloyd, and philosopher John Dewey (1859-1952). Mead and Dewey became close personal and intellectual friends, finding much common ground in their interests in philosophy and psychology. In those days, the lines between philosophy and psychology were not sharply drawn, and Mead was to teach and do research in psychology throughout his career (mostly social psychology after 1910).

George and Helen Mead's only child, Henry Castle Albert Mead, was born in Ann Arbor in 1892. When the boy grew up, he became a physician and married Irene Tufts (James Hayden Tufts' daughter), a psychiatrist.

In 1892, having completed his Ph.D. work at Freiburg, James Hayden Tufts received an administrative appointment at the newly-created University of Chicago to help its founding president, William Rainey Harper, organize the new university (which opened in the fall of 1892). The University of Chicago was organized around three main departments: Semitics, chaired by J.M. Powis Smith; Classics, chaired by Paul Shorey; and Philosophy, chaired by John Dewey as of 1894. Dewey was recommended for that position by Tufts, and Dewey agreed to move from the University of Michigan to the University of Chicago provided that his friend and colleague, George Herbert Mead, was given a position as assistant professor in the Chicago philosophy department.

Thus, the University of Chicago became the new center of American Pragmatism (which had earlier originated with Charles Sanders Peirce [1839-1914] and William James at Harvard). The "Chicago Pragmatists" were led by Tufts, Dewey, and Mead. Dewey left Chicago for Columbia University in 1904, leaving Tufts and Mead as the major spokesmen for the Pragmatist movement in Chicago.

Mead spent the rest of his life in Chicago. He was assistant professor of philosophy from 1894-1902; associate professor from 1902-1907; and full professor from 1907 until his death in 1931. During those years, Mead made substantial contributions in both social psychology and philosophy. Mead's major contribution to the field of social psychology was his attempt to show how the human self arises in the process of social interaction, especially by way of linguistic communication ("symbolic interaction"). In philosophy, as already mentioned, Mead was one of the major American Pragmatists. As such, he pursued and furthered the Pragmatist program and developed his own distinctive philosophical outlook centered around the concepts of sociality and temporality (see below).

Mrs. Helen Castle Mead died on December 25, 1929. George Mead was hit hard by her passing and gradually became ill himself. John Dewey arranged for Mead's appointment as a professor in the philosophy department at Columbia University as of the 1931-1932 academic year, but before he could take up that appointment, Mead died in Chicago on April 26, 1931.

2. Writings

During his more-than-40-year career, Mead thought deeply, wrote almost constantly, and published numerous articles and book reviews in philosophy and psychology. However, he never published a book. After his death, several of his students edited four volumes from stenographic records of his social psychology course at the University of Chicago, from Mead's lecture notes, and from Mead's numerous unpublished papers. The four books are The Philosophy of the Present (1932), edited by Arthur E. Murphy; Mind, Self, and Society (1934), edited by Charles W. Morris; Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century (1936), edited by Merritt H. Moore; and The Philosophy of the Act (1938), Mead's Carus Lectures of 1930, edited by Charles W. Morris.

Notable among Mead's published papers are the following: "Suggestions Towards a Theory of the Philosophical Disciplines" (1900); "Social Consciousness and the Consciousness of Meaning" (1910); "What Social Objects Must Psychology Presuppose" (1910); "The Mechanism of Social Consciousness" (1912); "The Social Self" (1913); "Scientific Method and the Individual Thinker" (1917); "A Behavioristic Account of the Significant Symbol" (1922); "The Genesis of Self and Social Control" (1925); "The Objective Reality of Perspectives" (1926);"The Nature of the Past" (1929); and "The Philosophies of Royce, James, and Dewey in Their American Setting" (1929). Twenty-five of Mead's most notable published articles have been collected in Selected Writings: George Herbert Mead, edited by Andrew J. Reck (Bobbs-Merrill, The Liberal Arts Press, 1964).

Most of Mead's writings and much of the secondary literature thereon are listed in the References and Further Reading, below.

3. Social Theory

a. Communication and Mind

In Mind, Self and Society (1934), Mead describes how the individual mind and self arises out of the social process. Instead of approaching human experience in terms of individual psychology, Mead analyzes experience from the "standpoint of communication as essential to the social order." Individual psychology, for Mead, is intelligible only in terms of social processes. The "development of the individual's self, and of his self- consciousness within the field of his experience" is preeminently social. For Mead, the social process is prior to the structures and processes of individual experience.

Mind, according to Mead, arises within the social process of communication and cannot be understood apart from that process. The communicational process involves two phases: (1) the "conversation of gestures" and (2) language, or the "conversation of significant gestures." Both phases presuppose a social context within which two or more individuals are in interaction with one another.

Mead introduces the idea of the "conversation of gestures" with his famous example of the dog-fight:

Dogs approaching each other in hostile attitude carry on such a language of gestures. They walk around each other, growling and snapping, and waiting for the opportunity to attack . . . . (Mind, Self and Society 14) The act of each dog becomes the stimulus to the other dog for his response. There is then a relationship between these two; and as the act is responded to by the other dog, it, in turn, undergoes change. The very fact that the dog is ready to attack another becomes a stimulus to the other dog to change his own position or his own attitude. He has no sooner done this than the change of attitude in the second dog in turn causes the first dog to change his attitude. We have here a conversation of gestures. They are not, however, gestures in the sense that they are significant. We do not assume that the dog says to himself, "If the animal comes from this direction he is going to spring at my throat and I will turn in such a way." What does take place is an actual change in his own position due to the direction of the approach of the other dog. (Mind, Self and Society 42-43, emphasis added).

In the conversation of gestures, communication takes place without an awareness on the part of the individual of the response that her gesture elicits in others; and since the individual is unaware of the reactions of others to her gestures, she is unable to respond to her own gestures from the standpoint of others. The individual participant in the conversation of gestures is communicating, but she does not know that she is communicating. The conversation of gestures, that is, is unconscious communication.

It is, however, out of the conversation of gestures that language, or conscious communication, emerges. Mead's theory of communication is evolutionary: communication develops from more or less primitive toward more or less advanced forms of social interaction. In the human world, language supersedes (but does not abolish) the conversation of gestures and marks the transition from non-significant to significant interaction.

Language, in Mead's view, is communication through significant symbols. A significant symbol is a gesture (usually a vocal gesture) that calls out in the individual making the gesture the same (that is, functionally identical) response that is called out in others to whom the gesture is directed (Mind, Self and Society 47).

Significant communication may also be defined as the comprehension by the individual of the meaning of her gestures. Mead describes the communicational process as a social act since it necessarily requires at least two individuals in interaction with one another. It is within this act that meaning arises. The act of communication has a triadic structure consisting of the following components: (1) an initiating gesture on the part of an individual; (2) a response to that gesture by a second individual; and (3) the result of the action initiated by the first gesture (Mind, Self and Society 76, 81). There is no meaning independent of the interactive participation of two or more individuals in the act of communication.

Of course, the individual can anticipate the responses of others and can therefore consciously and intentionally make gestures that will bring out appropriate responses in others. This form of communication is quite different from that which takes place in the conversation of gestures, for in the latter there is no possibility of the conscious structuring and control of the communicational act.

Consciousness of meaning is that which permits the individual to respond to her own gestures as the other responds. A gesture, then, is an action that implies a reaction. The reaction is the meaning of the gesture and points toward the result (the "intentionality") of the action initiated by the gesture. Gestures "become significant symbols when they implicitly arouse in an individual making them the same responses which they explicitly arouse, or are supposed [intended] to arouse, in other individuals, the individuals to whom they are addressed" (Mind, Self and Society 47). For example, "You ask somebody to bring a visitor a chair. You arouse the tendency to get the chair in the other, but if he is slow to act, you get the chair yourself. The response to the gesture is the doing of a certain thing, and you arouse that same tendency in yourself" (Mind, Self and Society 67). At this stage, the conversation of gestures is transformed into a conversation of significant symbols.

There is a certain ambiguity in Mead's use of the terms "meaning" and "significance." The question is, can a gesture be meaningful without being significant? But, if the meaning of a gesture is the response to that gesture, then there is meaning in the (non-significant) conversation of gestures — the second dog, after all, responds to the gestures of the first dog in the dog- fight and vice-versa.

However, it is the conversation of significant symbols that is the foundation of Mead's theory of mind. "Only in terms of gestures as significant symbols is the existence of mind or intelligence possible; for only in terms of gestures which are significant symbols can thinking — which is simply an internalized or implicit conversation of the individual with himself by means of such gestures — take place" (Mind, Self and Society 47). Mind, then, is a form of participation in an interpersonal (that is, social) process; it is the result of taking the attitudes of others toward one's own gestures (or conduct in general). Mind, in brief, is the use of significant symbols.

The essence of Mead's so-called "social behaviorism" is his view that mind is an emergent out of the interaction of organic individuals in a social matrix. Mind is not a substance located in some transcendent realm, nor is it merely a series of events that takes place within the human physiological structure. Mead therefore rejects the traditional view of the mind as a substance separate from the body as well as the behavioristic attempt to account for mind solely in terms of physiology or neurology. Mead agrees with the behaviorists that we can explain mind behaviorally if we deny its existence as a substantial entity and view it instead as a natural function of human organisms. But it is neither possible nor desirable to deny the existence of mind altogether. The physiological organism is a necessary but not sufficient condition of mental behavior (Mind, Self and Society 139). Without the peculiar character of the human central nervous system, internalization by the individual of the process of significant communication would not be possible; but without the social process of conversational behavior, there would be no significant symbols for the individual to internalize.

The emergence of mind is contingent upon interaction between the human organism and its social environment; it is through participation in the social act of communication that the individual realizes her (physiological and neurological) potential for significantly symbolic behavior (that is, thought). Mind, in Mead's terms, is the individualized focus of the communicational process — it is linguistic behavior on the part of the individual. There is, then, no "mind or thought without language;" and language (the content of mind) "is only a development and product of social interaction" (Mind, Self and Society 191- 192). Thus, mind is not reducible to the neurophysiology of the organic individual, but is an emergent in "the dynamic, ongoing social process" that constitutes human experience (Mind, Self and Society 7).

b. Action

For Mead, mind arises out of the social act of communication. Mead's concept of the social act is relevant, not only to his theory of mind, but to all facets of his social philosophy. His theory of "mind, self, and society" is, in effect, a philosophy of the act from the standpoint of a social process involving the interaction of many individuals, just as his theory of knowledge and value is a philosophy of the act from the standpoint of the experiencing individual in interaction with an environment.

There are two models of the act in Mead's general philosophy: (1) the model of the act-as-such, i.e., organic activity in general (which is elaborated in The Philosophy of the Act), and (2) the model of the social act, i.e., social activity, which is a special case of organic activity and which is of particular (although not exclusive) relevance in the interpretation of human experience. The relation between the "social process of behavior" and the "social environment" is "analogous" to the relation between the "individual organism" and the "physical-biological environment" (Mind, Self and Society 130).

The Act-As-Such

In his analysis of the act-as-such (that is, organic activity), Mead speaks of the act as determining "the relation between the individual and the environment" (The Philosophy of the Act 364). Reality, according to Mead, is a field of situations. "These situations are fundamentally characterized by the relation of an organic individual to his environment or world. The world, things, and the individual are what they are because of this relation [between the individual and his world]" (The Philosophy of the Act 215). It is by way of the act that the relation between the individual and his world is defined and developed.

Mead describes the act as developing in four stages: (1) the stage of impulse, upon which the organic individual responds to "problematic situations" in his experience (e.g., the intrusion of an enemy into the individual's field of existence); (2) the stage of perception, upon which the individual defines and analyzes his problem (e.g., the direction of the enemy's attack is sensed, and a path leading in the opposite direction is selected as an avenue of escape); (3) the stage of manipulation, upon which action is taken with reference to the individual's perceptual appraisal of the problematic situation (e.g., the individual runs off along the path and away from his enemy); and (4) the stage of consummation, upon which the encountered difficulty is resolved and the continuity of organic existence re- established (e.g., the individual escapes his enemy and returns to his ordinary affairs) (The Philosophy of the Act 3-25). ]

What is of interest in this description is that the individual is not merely a passive recipient of external, environmental influences, but is capable of taking action with reference to such influences; he reconstructs his relation to his environment through selective perception and through the use or manipulation of the objects selected in perception (e.g., the path of escape mentioned above). The objects in the environment are, so to speak, created through the activity of the organic individual: the path along which the individual escapes was not "there" (in his thoughts or perceptions) until the individual needed a path of escape. Reality is not simply "out there," independent of the organic individual, but is the outcome of the dynamic interrelation of organism and environment. Perception, according to Mead, is a relation between organism and object. Perception is not, then, something that occurs in the organism, but is an objective relation between the organism and its environment; and the perceptual object is not an entity out there, independent of the organism, but is one pole of the interactive perceptual process (The Philosophy of the Act 81).

Objects of perception arise within the individual's attempt to solve problems that have emerged in his experience, problems that are, in an important sense, determined by the individual himself. The character of the individual's environment is predetermined by the individual's sensory capacities. The environment, then, is what it is in relation to a sensuous and selective organic individual; and things, or objects, "are what they are in the relationship between the individual and his environment, and this relationship is that of conduct [i.e., action]" (The Philosophy of the Act 218).
The Social Act
While the social act is analogous to the act-as-such, the above-described model of "individual biological activity" (Mind, Self and Society 130) will not suffice as an analysis of social experience. The "social organism" is not an organic individual, but "a social group of individual organisms" (Mind, Self and Society 130). The human individual, then, is a member of a social organism, and his acts must be viewed in the context of social acts that involve other individuals. Society is not a collection of preexisting atomic individuals (as suggested, for example, by Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau), but rather a processual whole within which individuals define themselves through participation in social acts. The acts of the individual are, according to Mead, aspects of acts that are trans- individual. "For social psychology, the whole (society) is prior to the part (the individual), not the part to the whole; and the part is explained in terms of the whole, not the whole in terms of the part or parts" (Mind, Self and Society 7). Thus, the social act is a "dynamic whole," a "complex organic process," within which the individual is situated, and it is within this situation that individual acts are possible and have meaning.

Mead defines the social act in relation to the social object. The social act is a collective act involving the participation of two or more individuals; and the social object is a collective object having a common meaning for each participant in the act. There are many kinds of social acts, some very simple, some very complex. These range from the (relatively) simple interaction of two individuals (e.g., in dancing, in love-making, or in a game of handball), to rather more complex acts involving more than two individuals (e.g., a play, a religious ritual, a hunting expedition), to still more complex acts carried on in the form of social organizations and institutions (e.g., law- enforcement, education, economic exchange). The life of a society consists in the aggregate of such social acts.

It is by way of the social act that persons in society create their reality. The objects of the social world (common objects such as clothes, furniture, tools, as well as scientific objects such as atoms and electrons) are what they are as a result of being defined and utilized within the matrix of specific social acts. Thus, an animal skin becomes a coat in the experience of people (e.g., barbarians or pretenders to aristocracy) engaged in the social act of covering and/or adorning their bodies; and the electron is introduced (as a hypothetical object) in the scientific community's project of investigating the ultimate nature of physical reality.

Communication through significant symbols is that which renders the intelligent organization of social acts possible. Significant communication, as stated earlier, involves the comprehension of meaning, i.e., the taking of the attitude of others toward one's own gestures. Significant communication among individuals creates a world of common (symbolic) meanings within which further and deliberate social acts are possible. The specifically human social act, in other words, is rooted in the act of significant communication and is, in fact, ordered by the conversation of significant symbols.

In addition to its role in the organization of the social act, significant communication is also fundamentally involved in the creation of social objects. For it is by way of significant symbols that humans indicate to one another the object relevant to their collective acts. For example, suppose that a group of people has decided on a trip to the zoo. One of the group offers to drive the others in his car; and the others respond by following the driver to his vehicle. The car has thus become an object for all members of the group, and they all make use of it to get to the zoo. Prior to this particular project of going to the zoo, the car did not have the specific significance that it takes on in becoming instrumental in the zoo-trip. The car was, no doubt, an object in some other social act prior to its incorporation into the zoo-trip; but prior to that incorporation, it was not specifically and explicitly a means of transportation to the zoo. Whatever it was, however, would be determined by its role in some social act (e.g., the owner's project of getting to work each day, etc.). It is perhaps needless to point out that the decision to go to the zoo, as well as the decision to use the car in question as a means of transportation, was made through a conversation involving significant symbols. The significant symbol functions here to indicate "some object or other within the field of social behavior, an object of common interest to all the individuals involved in the given social act thus directed toward or upon that object" (Mind, Self and Society 46). The reality that humans experience is, for Mead, very largely socially constructed in a process mediated and facilitated by the use of significant symbols.

c. Self and Other

The Self as Social Emergent

The self, like the mind, is a social emergent. This social conception of the self, Mead argues, entails that individual selves are the products of social interaction and not the (logical or biological) preconditions of that interaction. Mead contrasts his social theory of the self with individualistic theories of the self (that is, theories that presuppose the priority of selves to social process). "The self is something which has a development; it is not initially there, at birth, but arises in the process of social experience and activity, that is, develops in the given individual as a result of his relations to that process as a whole and to other individuals within that process" (Mind, Self and Society 135). Mead's model of society is an organic model in which individuals are related to the social process as bodily parts are related to bodies.

The self is a reflective process — i.e., "it is an object to itself." For Mead, it is the reflexivity of the self that "distinguishes it from other objects and from the body." For the body and other objects are not objects to themselves as the self is.

It is perfectly true that the eye can see the foot, but it does not see the body as a whole. We cannot see our backs; we can feel certain portions of them, if we are agile, but we cannot get an experience of our whole body. There are, of course, experiences which are somewhat vague and difficult of location, but the bodily experiences are for us organized about a self. The foot and hand belong to the self. We can see our feet, especially if we look at them from the wrong end of an opera glass, as strange things which we have difficulty in recognizing as our own. The parts of the body are quite distinguishable from the self. We can lose parts of the body without any serious invasion of the self. The mere ability to experience different parts of the body is not different from the experience of a table. The table presents a different feel from what the hand does when one hand feels another, but it is an experience of something with which we come definitely into contact. The body does not experience itself as a whole, in the sense in which the self in some way enters into the experience of the self (Mind, Self and Society 136).

It is, moreover, this reflexivity of the self that distinguishes human from animal consciousness (Mind, Self and Society, fn., 137). Mead points out two uses of the term "consciousness": (1) "consciousness" may denote "a certain feeling consciousness" which is the outcome of an organism's sensitivity to its environment (in this sense, animals, in so far as they act with reference to events in their environments, are conscious); and (2) "consciousness" may refer to a form of awareness "which always has, implicitly at least, the reference to an 'I' in it" (that is, the term "consciousness" may mean self- consciousness) (Mind, Self and Society 165). It is the second use of the term "consciousness" that is appropriate to the discussion of human consciousness. While there is a form of pre-reflective consciousness that refers to the "bare thereness of the world," it is reflective (or self-) consciousness that characterizes human awareness. The pre-reflective world is a world in which the self is absent (Mind, Self and Society 135-136).

Self-consciousness, then, involves the objectification of the self. In the mode of self- consciousness, the "individual enters as such into his own experience . . . as an object" (Mind, Self and Society 225). How is this objectification of the self possible? The individual, according to Mead, "can enter as an object [to himself] only on the basis of social relations and interactions, only by means of his experiential transactions with other individuals in an organized social environment" (Mind, Self and Society 225). Self-consciousness is the result of a process in which the individual takes the attitudes of others toward herself, in which she attempts to view herself from the standpoint of others. The self-as-object arises out of the individual's experience of other selves outside of herself. The objectified self is an emergent within the social structures and processes of human intersubjectivity.

Symbolic Interaction and the Emergence of the Self

Mead's account of the social emergence of the self is developed further through an elucidation of three forms of inter-subjective activity: language, play, and the game. These forms of "symbolic interaction" (that is, social interactions that take place via shared symbols such as words, definitions, roles, gestures, rituals, etc.) are the major paradigms in Mead's theory of socialization and are the basic social processes that render the reflexive objectification of the self possible.

Language, as we have seen, is communication via "significant symbols," and it is through significant communication that the individual is able to take the attitudes of others toward herself. Language is not only a "necessary mechanism" of mind, but also the primary social foundation of the self:

I know of no other form of behavior than the linguistic in which the individual is an object to himself . . . (Mind, Self and Society 142). When a self does appear it always involves an experience of another; there could not be an experience of a self simply by itself. The plant or the lower animal reacts to its environment, but there is no experience of a self . . . . When the response of the other becomes an essential part in the experience or conduct of the individual; when taking the attitude of the other becomes an essential part in his behavior — then the individual appears in his own experience as a self; and until this happens he does not appear as a self (Mind, Self and Society 195).

Within the linguistic act, the individual takes the role of the other, i.e., responds to her own gestures in terms of the symbolized attitudes of others. This "process of taking the role of the other" within the process of symbolic interaction is the primal form of self-objectification and is essential to self- realization (Mind, Self and Society 160-161).

It ought to be clear, then, that the self-as-object of which Mead speaks is not an object in a mechanistic, billiard ball world of external relations, but rather it is a basic structure of human experience that arises in response to other persons in an organic social-symbolic world of internal (and inter- subjective) relations. This becomes even clearer in Mead's interpretation of playing and gaming. In playing and gaming, as in linguistic activity, the key to the generation of self-consciousness is the process of role-playing." In play, the child takes the role of another and acts as though she were the other (e.g., mother, doctor, nurse, Indian, and countless other symbolized roles). This form of role-playing involves a single role at a time. Thus, the other which comes into the child's experience in play is a "specific other" (The Philosophy of the Present 169).

The game involves a more complex form of role-playing than that involved in play. In the game, the individual is required to internalize, not merely the character of a single and specific other, but the roles of all others who are involved with him in the game. He must, moreover, comprehend the rules of the game which condition the various roles (Mind, Self and Society 151). This configuration of roles-organized-according-to- rules brings the attitudes of all participants together to form a symbolized unity: this unity is the "generalized other" (Mind, Self and Society 154). The generalized other is "an organized and generalized attitude" (Mind, Self and Society 195) with reference to which the individual defines her own conduct. When the individual can view herself from the standpoint of the generalized other, "self- consciousness in the full sense of the term" is attained.

The game, then, is the stage of the social process at which the individual attains selfhood. One of Mead's most outstanding contributions to the development of critical social theory is his analysis of games. Mead elucidates the full social and psychological significance of game-playing and the extent to which the game functions as an instrument of social control. The following passage contains a remarkable piece of analysis:

What goes on in the game goes on in the life of the child all the time. He is continually taking the attitudes of those about him, especially the roles of those who in some sense control him and on whom he depends. He gets the function of the process in an abstract way at first. It goes over from the play into the game in a real sense. He has to play the game. The morale of the game takes hold of the child more than the larger morale of the whole community. The child passes into the game and the game expresses a social situation in which he can completely enter; its morale may have a greater hold on him than that of the family to which he belongs or the community in which he lives. There are all sorts of social organizations, some of which are fairly lasting, some temporary, into which the child is entering, and he is playing a sort of social game in them. It is a period in which he likes "to belong," and he gets into organizations which come into existence and pass out of existence. He becomes a something which can function in the organized whole, and thus tends to determine himself in his relationship with the group to which he belongs. That process is one which is a striking stage in the development of the child's morale. It constitutes him a self-conscious member of the community to which he belongs (Mind, Self and Society 160, emphasis added).

The "Me" and the "I"

Although the self is a product of socio-symbolic interaction, it is not merely a passive reflection of the generalized other. The individual's response to the social world is active; she decides what she will do in the light of the attitudes of others; but her conduct is not mechanically determined by such attitudinal structures. There are, it would appear, two phases (or poles) of the self: (1) that phase which reflects the attitude of the generalized other and (2) that phase which responds to the attitude of the generalized other. Here, Mead distinguishes between the "me" and the "I." The "me" is the social self, and the "I" is a response to the "me" (Mind, Self and Society 178). "The 'I' is the response of the organism to the attitudes of the others; the 'me' is the organized set of attitudes of others which one himself assumes" (Mind, Self and Society 175). Mead defines the "me" as "a conventional, habitual individual," and the "I" as the "novel reply" of the individual to the generalized other (Mind, Self and Society 197). There is a dialectical relationship between society and the individual; and this dialectic is enacted on the intra-psychic level in terms of the polarity of the "me" and the "I." The "me" is the internalization of roles which derive from such symbolic processes as linguistic interaction, playing, and gaming; whereas the "I" is a "creative response" to the symbolized structures of the "me" (that is, to the generalized other).

Although the "I" is not an object of immediate experience, it is, in a sense, knowable (that is, objectifiable). The "I" is apprehended in memory; but in the memory image, the "I" is no longer a pure subject, but "a subject that is now an object of observation" (Selected Writings 142). We can understand the structural and functional significance of the "I," but we cannot observe it directly — it appears only ex post facto. We remember the responses of the "I" to the "me;" and this is as close as we can get to a concrete knowledge of the "I." The objectification of the "I" is possible only through an awareness of the past; but the objectified "I" is never the subject of present experience. "If you ask, then, where directly in your own experience the 'I' comes in, the answer is that it comes in as a historical figure" (Mind, Self and Society 174).

The "I" appears as a symbolized object in our consciousness of our past actions, but then it has become part of the "me." The "me" is, in a sense, that phase of the self that represents the past (that is, the already-established generalized other). The "I," which is a response to the "me," represents action in a present (that is, "that which is actually going on, taking place") and implies the restructuring of the "me" in a future. After the "I" has acted, "we can catch it in our memory and place it in terms of that which we have done," but it is now (in the newly emerged present) an aspect of the restructured "me" (Mind, Self and Society 204, 203).

Because of the temporal-historical dimension of the self, the character of the "I" is determinable only after it has occurred; the "I" is not, therefore, subject to predetermination. Particular acts of the "I" become aspects of the "me" in the sense that they are objectified through memory; but the "I" as such is not contained in the "me."

The human individual exists in a social situation and responds to that situation. The situation has a particular character, but this character does not completely determine the response of the individual; there seem to be alternative courses of action. The individual must select a course of action (and even a decision to do "nothing" is a response to the situation) and act accordingly, but the course of action she selects is not dictated by the situation. It is this indeterminacy of response that "gives the sense of freedom, of initiative" (Mind, Self and Society 177). The action of the "I" is revealed only in the action itself; specific prediction of the action of the "I" is not possible. The individual is determined to respond, but the specific character of her response is not fully determined. The individual's responses are conditioned, but not determined by the situation in which she acts (Mind, Self and Society 210-211). Human freedom is conditioned freedom.

Thus, the "I" and the "me" exist in dynamic relation to one another. The human personality (or self) arises in a social situation. This situation structures the "me" by means of inter-subjective symbolic processes (language, gestures, play, games, etc.), and the active organism, as it continues to develop, must respond to its situation and to its "me." This response of the active organism is the "I."

The individual takes the attitude of the "me" or the attitude of the "I" according to situations in which she finds herself. For Mead, "both aspects of the 'I' and the 'me' are essential to the self in its full expression" (Mind, Self and Society 199). Both community and individual autonomy are necessary to identity. The "I" is process breaking through structure. The "me" is a necessary symbolic structure which renders the action of the "I" possible, and "without this structure of things, the life of the self would become impossible" (Mind, Self and Society 214).

The Dialectic of Self and Other

The self arises when the individual takes the attitude of the generalized other toward herself. This "internalization" of the generalized other occurs through the individual's participation in the conversation of significant symbols (that is, language) and in other socialization processes (e.g., play and games). The self, then, is of great value to organized society: the internalization of the conversation of significant symbols and of other interactional symbolic structures allows for "the superior co-ordination" of "society as a whole," and for the "increased efficiency of the individual as a member of the group" (Mind, Self and Society 179). The generalized other (internalized in the "me") is a major instrument of social control; it is the mechanism by which the community gains control "over the conduct of its individual members" (Mind, Self and Society 155)."Social control," in Mead's words, "is the expression of the 'me' over against the expression of the 'I'" (Mind, Self and Society 210).

The genesis of the self in social process is thus a condition of social control. The self is a social emergent that supports the cohesion of the group; individual will is harmonized, by means of a socially defined and symbolized "reality," with social goals and values. "In so far as there are social acts," writes Mead, "there are social objects, and I take it that social control is bringing the act of the individual into relation with this social object" (The Philosophy of the Act 191). Thus, there are two dimensions of Mead's theory of internalization: (1) the internalization of the attitudes of others toward oneself and toward one another (that is, internalization of the interpersonal process); and (2) the internalization of the attitudes of others "toward the various phases or aspects of the common social activity or set of social undertakings in which, as members of an organized society or social group, they are all engaged" (Mind, Self and Society 154-155).

The self, then, has reference, not only to others, but to social projects and goals, and it is by means of the socialization process (that is, the internalization of the generalized other through language, play, and the game) that the individual is brought to "assume the attitudes of those in the group who are involved with him in his social activities" (The Philosophy of the Act 192). By learning to speak, gesture, and play in "appropriate" ways, the individual is brought into line with the accepted symbolized roles and rules of the social process. The self is therefore one of the most subtle and effective instruments of social control.

For Mead, however, social control has its limits. One of these limits is the phenomenon of the "I," as described in the preceding section. Another limit to social control is presented in Mead's description of specific social relations. This description has important consequences regarding the way in which the concept of the generalized other is to be applied in social analysis.

The self emerges out of "a special set of social relations with all the other individuals" involved in a given set of social projects (Mind, Self and Society 156-157). The self is always a reflection of specific social relations that are themselves founded on the specific mode of activity of the group in question. The concept of property, for example, presupposes a community with certain kinds of responses; the idea of property has specific social and historical foundations and symbolizes the interests and values of specific social groups.

Mead delineates two types of social groups in civilized communities. There are, on the one hand, "concrete social classes or subgroups" in which "individual members are directly related to one another." On the other hand, there are "abstract social classes or subgroups" in which "individual members are related to one another only more or less indirectly, and which only more or less indirectly function as social units, but which afford unlimited possibilities for the widening and ramifying and enriching of the social relations among all the individual members of the given society as an organized and unified whole" (Mind, Self and Society 157). Such abstract social groups provide the opportunity for a radical extension of the "definite social relations" which constitute the individual's sense of self and which structure her conduct.

Human society, then, contains a multiplicity of generalized others. The individual is capable of holding membership in different groups, both simultaneously and serially, and may therefore relate herself to different generalized others at different times; or she may extend her conception of the generalized other by identifying herself with a "larger" community than the one in which she has hitherto been involved (e.g., she may come to view herself as a member of a nation rather than as a member of a tribe). The self is not confined within the limits of any one generalized other. It is true that the self arises through the internalization of the generalized attitudes of others, but there is, it would appear, no absolute limit to the individual's capacity to encompass new others within the dynamic structure of the self. This makes strict and total social control difficult if not impossible.

Mead's description of social relations also has interesting implications vis-a-vis the sociological problem of the relation between consensus and conflict in society. It is clear that both consensus and conflict are significant dimensions of social process; and in Mead's view, the problem is not to decide either for a consensus model of society or for a conflict model, but to describe as directly as possible the function of both consensus and conflict in human social life.

There are two models of consensus-conflict relation in Mead's analysis of social relations. These may be schematized as follows:

  1. Intra-Group Consensus — Extra-Group Conflict
  2. Intra-Group Conflict — Extra-Group Consensus

In the first model, the members of a given group are united in opposition to another group which is characterized as the "common enemy" of all members of the first group. Mead points out that the idea of a common enemy is central in much of human social organization and that it is frequently the major reference-point of intra-group consensus. For example, a great many human organizations derive their raison d'etre and their sense of solidarity from the existence (or putative existence) of the "enemy" (communists, atheists, infidels, fascist pigs, religious "fanatics," liberals, conservatives, or whatever). The generalized other of such an organization is formed in opposition to the generalized other of the enemy. The individual is "with" the members of her group and "against" members of the enemy group.

Mead's second model, that of intra-group conflict and extra-group consensus, is employed in his description of the process in which the individual reacts against her own group. The individual opposes her group by appealing to a "higher sort of community" that she holds to be superior to her own. She may do this by appealing to the past (e.g., she may ground her criticism of the bureaucratic state in a conception of "Jeffersonian Democracy"), or by appealing to the future (e.g., she may point to the ideal of "all mankind," of the universal community, an ideal that has the future as its ever-receding reference point). Thus, intra-group conflict is carried on in terms of an extra-group consensus, even if the consensus is merely assumed or posited. This model presupposes Mead's conception of the multiplicity of generalized others, i.e., the field within which conflicts are possible. It is also true that the individual can criticize her group only in so far as she can symbolize to herself the generalized other of that group; otherwise she would have nothing to criticize, nor would she have the motivation to do so. It is in this sense that social criticism presupposes social- symbolic process and a social self capable of symbolic reflexive activity.

In addition to the above-described models of consensus-conflict relation, Mead also points out an explicitly temporal interaction between consensus and conflict. Human conflicts often lead to resolutions that create new forms of consensus. Thus, when such conflicts occur, they can lead to whole "reconstructions of the particular social situations" that are the contexts of the conflicts (e.g., a war between two nations may be followed by new political alignments in which the two warring nations become allies). Such reconstructions of society are effected by the minds of individuals in conflict and constitute enlargements of the social whole.

An interesting consequence of Mead's analysis of social conflict is that the reconstruction of society will entail the reconstruction of the self. This aspect of the social dynamic is particularly clear in terms of Mead's concept of intra-group conflict and his description of the dialectic of the "me" and the "I." As pointed out earlier, the "I" is an emergent response to the generalized other; and the "me" is that phase of the self that represents the social situation within which the individual must operate. Thus, the critical capacity of the self takes form in the "I" and has two dimensions: (1) explicit self- criticism (aimed at the "me") is implicit social criticism; and (2) explicit social criticism is implicit self- criticism. For example, the criticism of one's own moral principles is also the criticism of the morality of one's social world, for personal morality is rooted in social morality. Conversely, the criticism of the morality of one's society raises questions concerning one's own moral role in the social situation.

Since self and society are dialectical poles of a single process, change in one pole will result in change in the other pole. It would appear that social reconstructions are effected by individuals (or groups of individuals) who find themselves in conflict with a given society; and once the reconstruction is accomplished, the new social situation generates far-reaching changes in the personality structures of the individuals involved in that situation." In short," writes Mead, "social reconstruction and self or personality reconstruction are the two sides of a single process — the process of human social evolution" (Mind, Self and Society 309).

4. The Temporal Structure of Human Existence

The temporal structure of human existence, according to Mead, can be described in terms of the concepts of emergence, sociality, and freedom.

Emergence and Temporality

What is the ground of the temporality of human experience? Temporal structure, according to Mead, arises with the appearance of novel or "emergent" events in experience. The emergent event is an unexpected disruption of continuity, an inhibition of passage. The emergent, in other words, constitutes a problem for human action, a problem to be overcome. The emergent event, which arises in a present, establishes a barrier between present and future; emergence is an inhibition of (individual and collective) conduct, a disharmony that projects experience into a distant future in which harmony may be re-instituted. The initial temporal structure of human time-consciousness lies in the separation of present and future by the emergent event. The actor, blocked in his activity, confronts the emergent problem in his present and looks to the future as the field of potential resolution of conflict. The future is a temporally, and frequently spatially, distant realm to be reached through intelligent action. Human action is action-in-time.

Mead argues out that, without inhibition of activity and without the distance created by the inhibition, there can be no experience of time. Further, Mead believes that, without the rupture of continuity, there can be no experience at all. Experience presupposes change as well as permanence. Without disruption, "there would be merely the passage of events" (The Philosophy of the Act 346), and mere passage does not constitute change. Passage is pure continuity without interruption (a phenomenon of which humans, with the possible exception of a few mystics, have precious little experience). Change arises with a departure from continuity. Change does not, however, involve the total obliteration of continuity — there must be a "persisting non-passing content" against which an emergent event is experienced as a change (The Philosophy of the Act 330-331).

Experience begins with the problematic. Continuity itself cannot be experienced unless it is broken; that is, continuity is not an object of awareness unless it becomes problematic, and continuity becomes problematic as a result of the emergence of discontinuous events. Hence, continuity and discontinuity (emergence) are not contradictories, but dialectical polarities (mutually dependent levels of reality) that generate experience itself. "The now is contrasted with a then and implies that a background which is irrelevant to the difference between them has been secured within which the now and the then may appear. There must be banks within which the stream of time may flow" (The Philosophy of the Act 161).

Emergence, then, is a fundamental condition of experience, and the experience of the emergent is the experience of temporality. Emergence sunders present and future and is thereby an occasion for action. Action, moreover, occurs in time; the human act is infected with time — it aims at the future. Human action is teleological. Discontinuity, therefore, and not continuity (in the sense of mere duration or passage), is the foundation of time-experience (and of experience itself). The emergent event constitutes time, i.e., creates the necessity of time.

The Function of the Past in Human Experience

The emergent event is not only a problem for ongoing activity: it also constitutes a problem for rationality. Reason, according to Mead, is the search for causal continuity in experience and, in fact, must presuppose such continuity in its attempt to construct a coherent account of reality. Reason must assume that all natural events can be reduced to conditions that make the events possible. But the emergent event presents itself as discontinuous, as a disruption without conditions.

It is by means of the reconstruction of the past that the discontinuous event becomes continuous in experience: "The character of the past is that it connects what is unconnected in the merging of one present into another" ("The Nature of the Past" [1929], in Selected Writings 351). The emergent event, when placed within a reconstructed past, is a determined event; but since this past was reconstructed from the perspective of the emergent event, the emergent event is also a determining event (The Philosophy of the Present 15). The emergent event itself indicates the continuities within which the event may be viewed as continuous. There is, then, no question of predicting the emergent, for it is, by definition and also experientially, unpredictable; but once the emergent appears in experience, it may be placed within a continuity dictated by its own character. Determination of the emergent is retrospective determination.

Mead's conception of time entails a drastic revision of the idea of the irrevocability of the past. The past is "both irrevocable and revocable" (The Philosophy of the Present 2). There is no sense in the idea of an independent or "real" past, for the past is always formulated in the light of the emerging present. It is necessary to continually reformulate the past from the point of view of the newly emergent situation. For example, the movement for the liberation of African-Americans has led to the discovery of the American black's cultural past. "Black (or African-American) History" is, in effect, a function of the emergence of the civil rights movement in the late 1940s and early 1950s and the subsequent development of that movement. As far as most Americans were hitherto concerned, there simply was no history of the American black — there was only a history of white Europeans, which included the history of slavery in America.

There can be no finality in historical accounts. The past is irrevocable in the sense that something has happened; but what has happened (that is, the essence of the past) is always open to question and reinterpretation. Further, the irrevocability of the past "is found in the extension of the necessity with which what has just happened conditions what is emerging in the future" (The Philosophy of the Present 3). Irrevocability is a characteristic of the past only in relation to the demands of a present looking into the future. That is to say that even the sense that something has happened arises out of a situation in which an emergent event has appeared as a problem.

Like Edmund Husserl, Mead conceives of human consciousness as intentional in its structure and orientation: the world of conscious experience is "intended," "meant," "constituted," "constructed" by consciousness. Thus, objectivity can have meaning only within the domain of the subject, the realm of consciousness. It is not that the existence of the objective world is constituted by consciousness, but that the meaning of that world is so constituted. In Husserlian language, the existence of the objective world is transcendent, i.e., independent of consciousness; but the meaning of the objective world is immanent, i.e., dependent on consciousness. In Mead's "phenomenology" of historical experience, then, the past may be said to possess an objective existence, but the meaning of the past is constituted or constructed according to the intentional concerns of historical thought. The meaning of the past ("what has happened") is defined by an historical consciousness that is rooted in a present and that is opening upon a newly emergent future.

History is founded on human action in response to emergent events. Action is an attempt to adjust to changes that emerge in experience; the telos of the act is the re-establishment of a sundered continuity. Since the past is instrumental in the re-establishment of continuity, the adjustment to the emergent requires the creation of history. "By looking into the future," Mead observes, "society acquired a history" (The Philosophy of the Act 494). And the future- orientation of history entails that every new discovery, every new project, will alter our picture of the past.

Although Mead discounts the possibility of a transcendent past (that is, a past independent of any present), he does not deny the possibility of validity in historical accounts. An historical account will be valid or correct, not absolutely, but in relation to a specific emergent context. Accounts of the past "become valid in interpreting [the world] in so far as they present a history of becoming in [the world] leading up to that which is becoming today . . . . " (The Philosophy of the Present 9). Historical thought is valid in so far as it renders change intelligible and permits the continuation of activity. An appeal to an absolutely correct account of the past is not only impossible, but also irrelevant to the actual conduct of historical inquiry. A meaningful past is a usable past.

Historians are, to be sure, concerned with the truth of historical accounts, i.e., with the "objectivity" of the past. The historical conscience seeks to reconstruct the past on the basis of evidence and to present an accurate interpretation of the data of history. Mead's point is that all such reconstructions and interpretations of the past are grounded in a present that is opening into a future and that the time-conditioned nature and interests of historical thought made the construction of a purely "objective" historical account impossible. Historical consciousness is "subjective" in the sense that it aims at an interpretation of the past that will be humanly meaningful in the present and in the foreseeable future. Thus, for Mead, historical inquiry is the imaginative-but-honest, intelligent-and-intelligible reconstruction and interpretation of the human past on the basis of all available and relevant evidence. Above all, the historian seeks to define the meaning of the human past and, in that way, to make a contribution to humanity's search for an overall understanding of human existence.

Sociality and Time

The emergent event, then, is basic to Mead's theory of time. The emergent event is a becoming, an unexpected occurrence "which in its relation to other events gives structure to time" (The Philosophy of the Present 21). But what is the ontological status of emergence? What is its relation to the general structure of reality? The possibility of emergence is grounded in Mead's conception of the relatedness, the "sociality," of natural processes.

Mead's philosophy arises from a fundamental ecological vision of the world, a vision of the world containing a multiplicity of related systems (e.g., the bee system and the flower system, which together form the bee-flower system). Nature is a system of systems or relationships; it is not a collection of particles or fragments which are actually separate. Distinctions, for Mead, are abstractions within fields of activity; and all natural objects (animate or inanimate) exist within systems apart from which the existence of the objects themselves is unthinkable.

The sense of the organic body arises with reference to "external" objects; and these external objects in turn derive their character from their relation to an organic individual. The body-object and the physical object arise with reference to each other, and it is this relationship, in Mead's view, that constitutes the reality of each referent. "It is over against the surfaces of other things that the outside of the organism arises in experience, and then the experiences of the organism which are not in such contacts become the inside of the organism. It is a process in which the organism is bounded, and other things are bounded as well" (The Philosophy of the Act 160). Similarly, the resistance of the object to organic pressure is, in effect, the activity of the object; and this activity becomes the "inside" of the object. The inside of the object, moreover, is not a projection from the organism, but is there in the relation between the organism and thing (see The Philosophy of the Present 122-124, 131, 136). The relation between organism and object, then, is a social relation (The Philosophy of the Act 109-110).

Thus, the relation between a natural object (or event) and the system within which it exists is not unidirectional. The character of the object, on the one hand, is determined by its membership in a system; but, on the other hand, the character of the system is determined by the activity of the object (or event). There is a mutual determination of object and system, organism and environment, percipient event and consentient set (The Philosophy of the Act 330).

While this mutuality of individual and system is characteristic of all natural processes, Mead is particularly concerned with the biological realm and lays great emphasis on the interdependence and interaction of organism and environment. Whereas the environment provides the conditions within which the acts of the organism emerge as possibilities, it is the activity of the organism that transforms the character of the environment. Thus, "an animal with the power of digesting and assimilating what could not before be digested and assimilated is the condition for the appearance of food in his environment" (The Philosophy of the Act 334). In this respect, "what the individual is determines what the character of his environment will be" (The Philosophy of the Act 338).

The relation of organism and environment is not static, but dynamic. The activities of the environment alter the organism, and the activities of the organism alter the environment. The organism-environment relation is, moreover, complex rather than simple. The environment of any organism contains a multiplicity of processes, perspectives, systems, any one of which may become a factor in the organism's field of activity. The ability of the organism to act with reference to a multiplicity of situations is an example of the sociality of natural events. And it is by virtue of this sociality, this "capacity of being several things at once" (The Philosophy of the Present 49), that the organism is able to encounter novel occurrences.

By moving from one system to another, the organism confronts unfamiliar and unexpected situations which, because of their novelty, constitute problems of adjustment for the organism. These emergent situations are possible given the multiplicity of natural processes and given the ability of natural events (e.g., organisms) to occupy several systems at once. A bee, for example, is capable of relating to other bees, to flowers, to bears, to little boys, albeit with various attitudes. But sociality is not restricted to animate events. A mountain may be simultaneously an aspect of geography, part of a landscape, an object of religious veneration, the dialectical pole of a valley, and so forth. The capacity of sociality is a universal character of nature.

There are, then, two modes of sociality: (1) Sociality characterizes the "process of readjustment" by which an organism incorporates an emergent event into its ongoing experience. This sociality in passage, which is "given in immediate relation of the past and present," constitutes the temporal mode of sociality (The Philosophy of the Present 51). (2) A natural event is social, not only by virtue of its dynamic relationship with newly emergent situations, but also by virtue of its simultaneous membership in different systems at any given instant. In any given present, "the location of the object in one system places it in the others as well" (The Philosophy of the Present 63). The object is social, not merely in terms of its temporal relations, but also in terms of its relations with other objects in an instantaneous field. This mode of sociality constitutes the emergent event; that is, the state of a system at a given instant is the social reality within which emergent events occur, and it is this reality that must be adjusted to the exigencies of time. Thus, the principle of sociality is the ontological foundation of Mead's concept of emergence: sociality is the ground of the possibility of emergence as well as the basis on which emergent events are incorporated into the structure of ongoing experience.

Temporality and the Problem of Freedom

When Mead's theory of the self is placed in the context of his description of the temporality of human existence, it is possible to construct an account, not only of the reality of human freedom, but also of the conditions that give rise to the experience of loss of freedom.

Mead grounds his analysis of human consciousness in the social process of communication and, on that foundation, makes "the other" an integral part of self- understanding. The world in which the self lives, then, is an inter- subjective and interactive world — a "populated world" containing, not only the individual self, but also other persons. Intersubjectivity is to be explained in terms of that "meeting of minds" which occurs in conversation, learning, reading, and thinking (The Philosophy of the Act 52-53). It is on the basis of such socio-symbolic interactions between individuals, and by means of the conceptual symbols of the communicational process, that the mind and the self come into existence.

The human world is also temporally structured, and the temporality of experience, Mead argues, is a flow that is primarily present. The past is part of my experience now, and the projected future is also part of my experience now. There is hardly a moment when, turning to the temporality of my life, I do not find myself existing in the now. Thus, it would appear that whatever is for me, is now; and, needless to say, whatever is of importance or whatever is meaningful for me, is of importance or is meaningful now. This is true even if that which is important and meaningful for me is located in the "past" or in the "future." Existential time is time lived in the now. My existence is rooted in a "living present," and it is within this "living present" that my life unfolds and discloses itself. Thus, to gain full contact with oneself, it is necessary to focus one's consciousness on the present and to appropriate that present (that "existential situation") as one's own.

This "philosophy of the present" need not lead to a careless, "live only for today" attitude. Our past is always with us (in the form of memory, history, tradition, etc.), and it provides a context for the "living present." We live "in the present," but also "out of the past;" and to live well now, we cannot afford to "forget" the past. A fully meaningful human existence must be "lived now," but with continual reference to the past: we must continue to affirm "that which has been good," and we must work to eliminate or to avoid "that which has been bad." Moreover, a full human existence must be lived, not only in-the-present-out-of-the-past, but also in- the-present-toward-the-future. The human present opens toward the future. "Today" must always be lived with a concern for "tomorrow," for we are continually moving toward the future, whether we like it or not. Further, we are "called" into this future, toward ever new possibilities; and we must, if we wish to live well, develop a "right mindfulness" which orients our present- centered consciousness toward the possibilities and challenges of the impending future. But we must "live now" with reference to both past and future.

The self, as we have seen, is characterized in part by its activity (the "I") in response to its world, and how the individual is active with respect to his world is through his choices and his awareness of his choices. The individual experiences himself as having choices, or as being confronted with situations which require choices on his part. He does not (ordinarily) experience himself as being controlled by the world. The world presents obstacles to him, and yet he experiences himself as being able to respond to these obstacles in a variety (even though a finite variety) of ways.

One loses one's freedom, even one's selfhood, when one is unaware of one's choices or when one refuses to face the fact that one has choices. From the standpoint of Mead's description of the temporality of action and his emphasis on the importance of problematic situations in human experience, emergencies or "crises" in one's life are of the utmost existential significance. I am a being that exists in relation to a world. As such, it is essential that I experience myself as "in harmony with" the world; and if this proves difficult or impossible, then I am thrown into a "crisis," i.e., I am threatened with separation (Greek, krisis) from the world; and separation from the world, from the standpoint of a being- in-the-world, is tantamount to non- being. It is in this context that the loss of one's freedom, the experience of lost autonomy, becomes a real possibility. Encountering a crisis in the process of life, the individual may well experience himself as paralyzed, as "stuck" in his situation, as patient rather than as agent of change. But it is also the case that the experience of crisis may lead to a deepened sense of one's active involvement in the temporal unfolding of life. From Mead's point of view, a crisis is a "crucial time" or a turning-point in individual existence: negatively, it is a threat to the individual's continuity in and with his world; positively, it is an opportunity to redefine, broaden, and deepen the individual's sense of self and of the world to which the self is ontologically related.

Thus, it would appear that crises may in fact undermine the sense of freedom of choice; and yet, it is also true that crises constitute opportunities for the exercise of freedom since such "breaks" or discontinuities in our experience demand that we make decisions as to what we are "going to do now." In this way, break-downs might be viewed as break-throughs. Freedom denied on one level of experience is rediscovered at another. One must lose oneself in order to find oneself.

5. Perception and Reflection: Mead's Theory of Perspectives

Mead's concept of sociality, as we have seen, implies a vision of reality as situational, or perspectival. A perspective is "the world in its relationship to the individual and the individual in his relationship to the world" (The Philosophy of the Act 115). A perspective, then, is a situation in which a percipient event (or individual) exists with reference to a consentient set (or environment) and in which a consentient set exists with reference to a percipient event. There are, obviously, many such situations (or perspectives). These are not, in Mead's view, imperfect representations of "an absolute reality" that transcends all particular situations. On the contrary, "these situations are the reality" which is the world (The Philosophy of the Act 215).

Distance Experience

For Mead, perceptual objects arise within the act and are instrumental in the consummation of the act. At the perceptual stage of the act, these objects are distant from the perceiving individual: they are "over there;" they are "not here" and "not now." The distance is both spatial and temporal. Such objects invite the perceiving individual to act with reference to them, to "make contact" with them. Thus, Mead speaks of perceptual objects as "plans of action" that "control" the "action of the individual" (The Philosophy of the Present 176 and The Philosophy of the Act 262). Distance experience implies contact experience. Perception leads on to manipulation.

The readiness of the individual to make contact with distant objects is what Mead calls a "terminal attitude." Terminal attitudes "are beginnings of the contact response that will be made to the object when the object is reached" (The Philosophy of the Act 161). Such attitudes "are those which, if carried out into overt action, would lead to movements which, if persevered in, would overcome the distances and bring the objects into the manipulatory sphere" (The Philosophy of the Act 171). A terminal attitude, then, is an implicit manipulation of a distant object; it stands at the beginning of the act and is an intellectual-and-emotional posture in terms of which the individual encounters the world. As present in the beginning of the act, the terminal attitude contains the later stages of the act in the sense that perception implies manipulation and in the sense that manipulation is aimed at the resolution of a problem. In terminal attitudes, all stages of the act interpenetrate.

Within the act, then, there is a tendency on the part of the perceiving individual to approach distant objects in terms of the "values of the manipulatory sphere." Distant objects are perceived "with the dimensions they would have if they were brought within the field in which we could both handle and see them" (The Philosophy of the Act 170-171). For example, a distant shape is seen as being palpable, as having a certain size and weight, as having such and such a texture, and so forth. In perception, the manipulatory area is extended, and the distant object becomes hypothetically a contact object.

In immediate perceptual experience, the distant object is in the future. Contact with the distant object is implicit, i.e., anticipated. "The percept," according to Mead, "is there as a promise" (The Philosophy of the Act 103). In so far as the act of perception involves terminal attitudes, the promise (or futurity) of the distant object is "collapsed" into a hypothetical "now" in which the perceiving individual and the perceptual object exist simultaneously. The temporal distance between individual and object is thus suspended; this suspension of time permits alternative (and perhaps conflicting) contact reactions to the object to be "tested" in imagination. Thus, the act may be "completed" in abstraction before it is completed in fact. In this sense, "the percept is a collapsed act" (The Philosophy of the Act 128).

The contemporaneity of individual and distant object is an abstraction within the act. In the collapsed act, time is abstracted from space "for the purposes of our conduct" (The Philosophy of the Present 177). Prior to actual manipulation, the perceiving individual anticipates a variety of ways in which a given object might be manipulated. This implicit testing of alternative responses to the distant object is the essence of reflective conduct. The actual futurity of the distant object is suspended, and the object is treated as though it were present in the manipulatory area. The time of the collapsed act, therefore, is an abstracted time that involves "the experience of inhibited action in which the goal is present as achieved through the individual assuming the attitude of contact response, and thus leaving the events that should elapse between the beginning and the end of the act present only in their abstracted character as passing" (The Philosophy of the Act 232).

Thus, in the abstracted time of the collapsed act, "certain objects cease to be events, cease to pass as they are in reality passing and in their permanence become the conditions of our action, and events take place with reference to them" (The Philosophy of the Present 177). The perceiving individual's terminal attitudes constitute an anticipatory contact experience in which the futurity of distant objects is reduced to an abstract contemporaneity. This reduction of futurity, we have seen, is instrumental in the reflective conduct of the acting individual.

In perception, then, distant objects are reduced to the manipulatory area and become (hypothetically) contact objects. "The fundamentals of perception are the spatio-temporal distances of objects lying outside the manipulatory area and the readiness of the organism to act toward them as they will be if they come within the manipulatory area" (The Philosophy of the Act 104). Perception involves the assumption of contact qualities in the distant object. The object is removed from its actual temporal position and is incorporated in a "permanent" space which is actually the space "of the manipulatory area, hypothetically extended" (The Philosophy of the Act 185). The object, which is actually spatio-temporally distant, becomes, hypothetically and for the purposes of reflective conduct, spatio-temporally present: it is, in the perceiving individual's assumption of the contact attitude, both "here" and "now."


Early modern accounts of perception, in an attempt to ground the theories and methods of modern science in a philosophical framework, made a distinction between the "primary" and "secondary" qualities of objects. Galileo articulated the latter distinction as follows:

I feel myself impelled by the necessity, as soon as I conceive a piece of matter or corporeal substance, of conceiving that in its own nature it is bounded and figured in such and such a figure, that in relation to others it is either large or small, that it is in this or that place, in this or that time, that it is in motion or remains at rest . . . , that it is single, few or many; in short by no imagination can a body be separated from such conditions: but that it must be white or red, bitter or sweet, sounding or mute, of a pleasant or unpleasant odour, I do not perceive my mind forced to acknowledge it necessarily accompanied by such conditions; so if the senses are not the escorts, perhaps the reason or the imagination by itself would never have arrived at them. Hence I think that these tastes, odours, colors, etc., on the side of the object in which they seem to exist, are nothing but mere names, but hold their residence solely in the sensitive body; so that if the animal were removed, every such quality would be abolished and annihilated (quoted by E.A. Burtt, The Metaphysical Foundations of Modern Physical Science [Doubleday, 1932], 85-86).

Another way of putting this is to say that the primary qualities of an object are those which are subject to precise mathematical calculation, whereas the secondary qualities of the object are those which are rooted in the sensibility of the perceiving organism and which are therefore not "objectively" quantifiable. The primary qualities (number, position, extension, bulk, and so forth) are there in the object, but the secondary qualities are subjective reactions to the object on the part of the sensitive organism. A corollary of this doctrine is that the primary qualities, because they are objective, are more "knowable" than are the subjective secondary qualities.

A serious breakdown in the theory of primary and secondary qualities appeared in the critical epistemology of George Berkeley. According to Berkeley, whatever we know of objects, we know on the basis of perception. The primary as well as the secondary qualities of objects are apprehended in sensation. Moreover, primary qualities are never perceived except in conjunction with secondary qualities. Both primary and secondary qualities, therefore, are derived from perception and are ideas "in the mind." When we "know" the primary qualities of an object, what we "know" are "our own ideas and sensations." Thus, Berkeley calls into question the "objectivity" of the primary qualities; these qualities, it would appear, are as dependent upon a perceiving organism as are secondary qualities. The outcome of Berkeley's radical subjectivism (which reaches its apogee in the skepticism of Hume) is an epistemological crisis in which the "knowability" of the external world is rendered problematic.

Mead's account of distance experience offers a description of the experiential basis of the separation of primary and secondary qualities. In the exigencies of action, we have seen, there is a tendency on the part of the acting individual to reduce distant objects to the contact area. "It is this collapsing of the act," according to Mead, "which is responsible for the so- called subjective nature of the secondary qualities . . . [of] objects" (The Philosophy of the Act 121). The contact characters of the object become the main focus within the act, while the distance characters are bracketed out (that is, held in suspension or ignored for the time being). For the purposes of conduct, "the reality of what we see is what we can handle" (The Philosophy of the Act 105). In Mead's analysis of perception, the distinction between distance and contact characters is roughly equivalent to the traditional distinction between secondary and primary qualities, respectively. For Mead, however, the distance characters of an object are not "subjective," but are as objective as the contact characters. Distance characters (such as color, sound, odor, and taste) are there in the act; they appear in the transition from impulse to perception and are present even in manipulation: "In the manipulatory area one actually handles the colored, odorous, sounding, sapid object. The distance characters seem to be no longer distant, and the object answers to a collapsed act" (The Philosophy of the Act 121).

Mead's theory of perspectives is, in effect, an attempt to make clear the objective intentionality of perceptual experience. In Mead's relational conception of biological existence, there is a mutual determination of organism and environment; the character of the organism determines the environment, just as the character of the environment determines the organism.

In his opposition to outright environmental determinism, Mead points out that the sensitivity, selectivity, and organizational capacities of organisms are sources of the control of the environment by the form. On the human level, for example, we find the phenomenon of attention. The human being selects her stimuli and thereby organizes the field within which she acts. Attention, then, is characterized by its selectivity and organizing tendency. "Here we have the organism as acting and deter mining its environment. It is not simply a set of passive senses played upon by the stimuli that come from without. The organism goes out and determines what it is going to respond to, and organizes the world" (Mind, Self and Society 25). Attention is the foundation of human intelligence; it is the capacity of attention that gives us control over our experience and conduct. Attention is one of the elements of human freedom.

The relation between organism and environment is, in a word, interactive. The perceptual object arises within this interactive matrix and is "determined by its reference to some percipient event, or individual, in a consentient set" (The Philosophy of the Act 166). In other words, perceptual objects are perspectively determined, and perspectives are determined by perceiving individuals.

Even when we consider only sense data, the object is clearly a function of the whole situation whose perspective is determined by the individual. There are peculiarities in the objects which depend upon the individual as an organism and the spatio-temporal position of the individual. It is one of the important results of the modern doctrine of relativity that we are forced to recognize that we cannot account for these peculiarities by stating the individual in terms of his environment. (The Philosophy of the Act 224).

The perceiving individual cannot be explained in terms of the so-called external world, since that individual is a necessary condition of the appearance of that world.

Mead thus abandons, on the basis of his interpretation of relativity theory, the object of Newtonian physics. But in addition to denying the concrete existence of independent objects, he also denies the existence of the independent psyche. There is nothing subjective about perceptual experience. If objects exist with reference to the perceiving individual, it is also true that the perceiving individual exists with reference to objects. The qualities of objects (distance as well as contact qualities) exist in the relation between the perceiving individual and the world. The so-called secondary sensuous qualities, therefore, are objectively present in the individual-world matrix; sensuous characters are there in a given perspective on reality.

In actual perceptual experience, the object is objectively present in relation to the individual. Whereas the relation between the world and the perceiving individual led Berkeley to a radical subjectification of experience, Mead's relationism leads him to an equally radical objectification of experience.

Perspectives, in Mead's view, are objectively real. Perspectives are "there in nature," and natural reality is the overall "organization of perspectives." There is, so far as we can directly know, no natural reality beyond the organization of perspectives, no noumena, no independent "world of physical particles in absolute space and time" (The Philosophy of the Present 163). The cosmos is nature stratified into a multiplicity of perspectives, all of which are interrelated. Perspectival stratifications of nature "are not only there in nature but they are the only forms of nature that are there" (The Philosophy of the Present 171).

The Scientific Object

Mead distinguishes two main types of perspective: (1) the perceptual perspective and (2) the reflective perspective. A perceptual perspective is rooted in the space-time world in which action is unreflective. This is the world of immediate perceptual experience. A reflective perspective is a response to the world of perceptual perspectives. The perspectives of fig trees and wasps are, from the standpoint of the trees and wasps (hypothetically considered), perceptually independent, except for certain points of intersection (that is, actual contacts). "But in the reflective perspective of the man who plants the fig trees and insures the presence of the wasps, both life-histories run their courses, and their intersection provides a dimension from which their interconnection maintains their species" (The Philosophy of the Act 185). Reflectively, the fig tree perspective and the wasp perspective form a single perspective "that includes the perspectives of both" (The Philosophy of the Act 184). The world of reflective perspectives is the world of reflective thought and action, the world of distance experience and the world of scientific inquiry. It is within the reflective perspective that the hypothetical objects of the collapsed act arise. Since Mead's conception of distance experience has been discussed earlier, the present analysis will concentrate on the emergence of the scientific object in reflective experience.

Corresponding to the two types of perspective outlined above are two attitudes toward the perceptual objects which arise in experience. There is, first, and corresponding to the perceptual perspective, "the attitude of immediate experience," which is grounded in "the world that is there" (The Philosophy of the Act 14). The world that is there (a phrase Mead uses over and over again) includes our own acts, our own bodies, and our own psychological responses to the things that emerge in our ongoing activity. Perceptual objects, in the world that is there, are what they appear to be in their relation to the perceiving individual.

The second attitude toward perceptual objects is that of "reflective analysis," which attempts to set forth the preconditions of perceptual experience. This attitude corresponds to the reflective perspective. It is through reflective analysis of perceptual objects that scientific objects are constructed. Examples of scientific objects are the Newtonian notions of absolute space and absolute time, the concept of the world at an instant (absolute simultaneity), the notion of "ultimate elements" (atoms, electrons, particles), and so on. Such objects, according to Mead, are hypothetical abstractions which arise in the scientific attempt to explain the world of immediate experience. "The whole tendency of the natural sciences, as exhibited especially in physics and chemistry, is to replace the objects of immediate experience by hypothetical objects which lie beyond the range of possible experience" (The Philosophy of the Act 291). Scientific objects are not objects of experience. Science accounts for the perceptible in terms of the non- perceptible (and often the imperceptible).

There is a danger in the reflective analysis of the world that is there, namely, the reification of scientific objects and the subjectification of perceptual objects. That is, it is possible to conceive of the perceptual world as a product of organic sensitivity (including human consciousness) while the world of scientific objects is "conceived of as entirely independent of perceiving individuals" (The Philosophy of the Act 284- 285). According to Mead, this formulation of the relation between scientific objects and perceptual objects is "entirely uncritical" (The Philosophy of the Act 19). The alleged separation of scientific and perceptual objects leads to a "bifurcated nature" in which experience is cut off from reality through the dualism of primary and secondary qualities. Mead's critique of the latter doctrine, discussed above, reveals that "the organism is a part of the physical world we are explaining" (The Philosophy of the Act 21). and that the perceptual object, with all of its qualities, is objectively there in the relation between organism and world. The scientific object, moreover, has ultimate reference to the perceptual world. The act of reflective analysis within which the scientific object arises presupposes the world that is there in perceptual experience. Scientific objects are abstractions within the reflective act and are, in effect, attempts to account for the objects of perceptual experience. And it is to the world that is there that the scientist must go to confirm or disconfirm the hypothetical objects of scientific theory.

Reflective analysis thus arises within and presupposes an unreflective world of immediate experience. And it is this immediate world "which is the final test of the reality of scientific hypotheses as well as the test of the truth of all our ideas and suppositions" (Mind, Self and Society 352). In Mind, Self and Society, Mead refers to the unreflective world as the world of the "biologic individual." "The term," he points out,

refers to the individual in an attitude and at a moment in which the impulses sustain an unfractured relation with the objects around him . . . . I have termed it "biologic" because the term lays emphasis on the living reality which may be distinguished from reflection. A later reflection turns back upon it and endeavors to present the complete interrelationship between the world and the individual in terms of physical stimuli and biological mechanisms [scientific objects]; the actual experience did not take place in this [hypothetical] form but in the form of unsophisticated reality (Mind, Self and Society 352, 353, emphasis added).

The world that is there is prior to the reflective world of scientific theory. The reification of scientific objects at the expense of perceptual experience is, in Mead's view, the product of an "uncritical scientific imagination" (The Philosophy of the Act 21).

Mead's analysis of the scientific object is an attempt to establish the actual relation between reflective analysis and perceptual experience. His aim is to demonstrate the objective reality of the perceptual world. He does not, however, deny the reality of scientific objects. Scientific objects are hypothetical objects which are real in so far as they render the experiential world intelligible and controllable. Harold N. Lee, in discussing Mead's philosophy, points out that "the task of science is to understand the world we live in and to enable us to act intelligently within it; it is not to construct a new and artificial world except in so far as the artificial picture aids in understanding and controlling the world we live in. The artificial picture is not be substituted for the world" (Lee 56, emphasis added). Scientific knowledge is not final, but hypothetical; and the reality of scientific objects is, therefore, hypothetical rather than absolute.

Reflective conduct takes place with reference to problems that emerge in the world that is there, and the construction of scientific objects is aimed at solving these problems. Problematic situations occur within the world that is there; it is not the entire world of experience that becomes problematic, but only aspects of that world. And while the scientific attitude is "ready to question everything," it does not "question everything at once" (Selected Writings 200). "The scientist," according to Mead, "always deals with an actual problem;" he does not question "the whole world of meaning," but only that part of the world which has come into conflict with accepted doctrine. The unquestioned aspects of the world "form the necessary field without which no conflict can arise." "The possible calling in question of any content, whatever it may be, means always that there is left a field of unquestioned reality" (Selected Writings 205). It is to this field of unquestioned reality that the scientist returns to test his reconstructed theory. "The world of the scientist is always there as one in which reconstruction is taking place with continual shifting of problems, but as a real world within which the problems arise" (Selected Writings 206, emphasis added).

6. Philosophy of History

a. The Nature of History

History, according to Mead, is the collective time of the social act. Historical thought arises in response to emergent events (crises, new situations, unexpected disruptions) that are confronted in community life. Mead's general description of experiential time holds with reference to the time of historical experience: the continuity of experience is rendered problematic by the emergent event; present and future are cut off from each other, and the past (both in terms of its content and of its meaning) is called into question; the past is reconstructed in such a way that the emergent event is seen as continuous with the past. In this manner, the present difficulty becomes intelligible, and the emergent discontinuity of experience is potentially resolvable. Historical thought is a reconstruction of a communal past in an attempt to understand the nature and significance of a communal present and a (potential) communal future. Historical accounts are never final since historical thought continually restates the past in terms of newly emergent situations in a present that opens upon a future.

Human life is an ongoing process that is temporally structured. The existential present, the "now" within which we act, is dynamic and implies a past and a future. The notion of the world at an instant (the knife-edge present) is, according to Mead, an abstraction within the act which may be instrumental in the pursuit of consummation; but as a description of concrete experience, the knife-edge present is a specious present. The specious present is not the actual present of ongoing experience. The present, in Mead's words, "is something that is happening, going on" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 300). "Our experience is always a passing experience, and . . . this passing experience always involves an extension into other experiences. It is what has just happened, what is going on, what is just appearing in the future, that gives to our experience its peculiar character. It is never an experience just at an instant. There is no such thing as the experience of a bare instant as such" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 299). Human experience is fundamentally dynamic, and human life is built on a temporal foundation.

The emergent event is the foundation of novelty in experience. This novelty is characteristic, not only of the present, but also of the past and future. The future, on the one hand, lies beyond the emergent present; and the novelty of the future takes the form of the unexpected. The emergent event creates a future that comes to us as a surprise. The past, on the other hand, must be reinterpreted in the light of the emergent event; the result of such reinterpretation is nothing less than a new past. Consciousness of the past develops in response to emergent events that alter our sense of temporal relationships.

We find that each generation has a different history, that it is a part of the apparatus of each generation to reconstruct its history. A different Caesar crosses the Rubicon not only with each author but with each generation. That is, as we look back over the past, it is a different past. The experience is something like that of a person climbing a mountain. As he looks back over the terrain he has covered, it presents a continually different picture. So the past is continually changing as we look at it from the point of view of different authors, different generations. It is not simply the future [and present] which is novel, then; the past is also novel (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 116-117).

History is the reconstruction of the past in response to a new present that opens toward a new future. This emphasis on the novelty of human experience pervades Mead's thought. Science, according to Mead, thrives on novelty. Scientific inquiry is, in essence, a response to exceptions to laws. While science, on the one hand, defines knowledge as "finding uniformities, finding rules, laws" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 270), it also, on the other hand, seeks to upset all uniformities, rules, and laws through the quest for novelty. Scientific inquiry arises out of the conflict between what was expected to happen and what actually happens; contradictions in experience are the starting- points for the scientific reconstruction of knowledge (Mead, Selected Writings 188).

Science, for Mead, is a continual reconstruction of our conception of the world in response to novel situations. Mead's slogan for science is, "The law is dead; long live the law!" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 286). Science is a form of human existence, a way of moving with the changes that emerge before us. Science is essentially "a method, a way of understanding the world" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 288).

History is the science of the human past. Historical inquiry presents the past "on the basis of actual documents and their interpretation in terms of historical criticism" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 448). But the historical past, as we have seen, is not independent of present and future. Historical inquiry, like scientific inquiry in general, takes place in a present that has become problematic through the occurrence of an emergent event. An ancient village is unearthed in Asia Minor, and the rise of human civilization is suddenly pushed back five thousand years in time; the demand on the part of African-Americans for liberty and identity leads to a revaluation of black culture in terms of its historical roots.

In Mead's conception of historical method, the past is in the present and becomes meaningful in the present. As Tonness has suggested, the past is not "a metaphysical reality accessible to present activity," but an "epistemological reference system" which gives coherence to the emerging present (606). Historical thought reconstructs the past continually in an attempt to reveal the cognitive significance of present and future.

It is not only the content of the past that is subject to change. Past events have meanings that are also changed as novel events emerge in ongoing experience. The meaning of past events is determined by the relation of those events to a present. The elucidation of such meaning is the task of historical thought and inquiry. An historical account, as we have seen, is true to the extent that the present is rendered coherent by reference to past events. Historical thought reinterprets the past in terms of the present. But this reinterpretation is not capricious. The historical past arises in the reexamination and representation of evidence. Historical accounts must be documented. No historical account, however, is final. The meaning of the past is always open to question; any given interpretation of the past may be criticized from the standpoint of a different interpretation.

Historical truth, in Mead's view, is relative truth. The meaning of the past changes as present slides into present (The Philosophy of the Present 9) and as different individuals and groups are confronted with new situations that demand a temporal reintegration of experience. A new present suggests a new future and demands a new past. This interdependence of past, present, and future is the essential character of human temporality and of historical consciousness.

b. History and Self-Consciousness

In Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century, Mead offers the Romantic movement of the late 18th and 19th centuries as an example of the present and future orientation of human inquiries into the past. Mead's description of the Romantics' reconstruction of self-consciousness on the basis of a reconstructed past is a concrete illustration of his conception of historical consciousness as developing with reference to a problematic present. The Romantic historians and philosophers, confronted with the disruption of experience, which was the result of the early modern revolutionary period, turned to the medieval past in an effort to redefine the historical and cultural identity of European man. The major characteristic of Romantic thought, according to Mead, was an attempt to redefine European self- consciousness through the re-appropriation of the historical past. "It was the essence of the Romantic movement to return to the past from the point of view of the self-consciousness of the Romantic period, to become aware of itself in terms of the past" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 447- 448). The European had been cut off from his past by the political and cultural revolutions of the 16th, 17th, and 18th centuries; and in the post-revolutionary world of the early 19th century, the Romantic movement represented the European quest for a reconstructed identity. It was history that provided the basis for this reconstruction.

The Revolt of Reason Against Authority

The idea of rationality has played a central role in modern social theory. The revolt against arbitrary authority "came on the basis of a description of human nature as having in it a rational principle from which authority could proceed" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 12). Thus, the aim of modern social theory has been to root social institutions in human nature rather than in divine providence. The doctrine of the rights of man and the idea of the social contract, for example, were brought together by Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau in an effort to ground political order in a purely human world. Society was conceived as a voluntary association of individuals; and the aim of this association was the preservation of natural rights to such goods as life, liberty, and property. Social authority, then, was derived from the individuals who had contracted to live together and to pursue certain human goals. This analysis of society was at the root of the revolutionary social criticism of the eighteenth century.

When men came to conceive the order of society as flowing from the rational character of society itself; when they came to criticize institutions from the point of view of their immediate function in preserving order, and criticized that order from the point of view of its purpose and function; when they approached the study of the state from the point of view of political science; then, of course, they found themselves in opposition to the medieval attitude which accepted its institutions as given by God to the church (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 13-14).

But the outcome of "the revolution," according to Mead, was not what the philosophers of the age of reason had expected. The institutions of the medieval past (e.g., monarchy, theocracy, economic feudalism) were either eliminated or severely limited in their scope and power. But the new regime contained reactionary elements of its own. The victorious bourgeoisie began to build a new class society based on the dialectic of capital and labor; and in this new society, the rights of man came to be conceived in terms of the successful struggle for economic power (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 223). Each man came to be viewed as "an economic unit," and the freedom of man became the freedom to compete for profits in the market (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 217).

The initial effects of the rise of capitalist society were disastrous for the working classes. "When labor was brought into the factory centers, there sprang up great cities in which men and women lived in almost impossible conditions. And there sprang up factories built around the machine in which men, women, and children worked under ever so hideous conditions" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 206). This situation was rationalized by an ideology that defined human rights in terms of economic competition and that "regarded industry as that which provided the morale of a laborer community" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 207).

Under such conditions, the rights and liberties for which "the revolution" had been fought became more ideological than real. It was only after the subsequent rise of the trade union and socialist movements that the contradiction between ideology and reality began to be transcended.

While "the revolution" was at least partially fulfilled in England and America, it was, from the standpoint of the early nineteenth century, a total failure on the European continent. The French Revolution deteriorated into a period of political terror that laid the foundation for the emergence of Napoleon's imperialism. The ideals of liberty, equality, and fraternity proved inadequate as bases for a fully rational society.

These ideals, in Mead's view, are politically naive. The concept of freedom is negative; it is a demand "that the individual shall be free from restraint" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 22). In the actual political world, where there is a conflict of wills, the concept of freedom falls into contradiction with itself. The freedom of one individual or group often infringes upon the freedom of another individual or group (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 22).

The concept of equality, which demands that "each person shall have . . . the same political [and perhaps economic] standing as every other person" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 23), is also far removed from the actual conditions of political and economic life. According to Mead, any society is a complex organization of many individuals and groups. These individuals and groups possess varying degrees of power and prestige. Given this situation, the concept of equality is at most an ideal to be pursued; but it is not a description of what goes on the in the concrete social world.

Similarly, the ideal of fraternity, the idea of the comradeship of all humanity, is "much too vague to be made the basis for the organization of the state." The concept of fraternity ignores the fact that, all too often, "people have to depend upon their sense of hostility to other persons in order to identify themselves with their own group" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 24).

The ideals of liberty, equality, and fraternity are, from Mead's standpoint, abstract ideals that could not survive the post-revolutionary struggles for political supremacy and the control of property.

The Romantic movement emerged in the aftermath of the failure of "the revolution." "There came a sense of defeat, after the breakdown of the Revolution, after the failure to organize a society on the basis of liberty, equality, and fraternity. And it is out of this sense of defeat that a new movement arose, a movement which in general terms passes under the title of 'romanticism'" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 57). The failure of "the revolution" left Europe in confusion. The European's ties to his medieval past had been severed, but his revolutionary hopes had not been realized. He was caught between two worlds. He could not be sure of his identity. His sense of self was in crisis. The Romantic movement was an attempt to overcome this crisis by returning to and reconstructing the European past. Romanticism, then, was an effort to reestablish the continuity between the past, present, and future of European culture.

Romantic Self-Consciousness

The Romantic conception of the self was an outgrowth of Kant's critique of associationism. "What took place in the Romantic period along a philosophical line was to take this [the?] transcendental unity of apperception, which was for Kant a bare logical function, together with the postulation of the self which we could not possibly know but which Kant said we could not help assuming, and compose them into the new romantic self" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 67). The Romantic self, however, was not conceived of as transcendental. The Romantics did not "postulate" the self; they asserted it "as something which is directly given in experience" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 86). The Romantics agreed with Kant that the self is the basis of all knowledge and judgment. But while the Kantian self had been developed as a regulative concept in the attempt to render experience intelligible, the Romantic self was held to be actually constitutive of experience. The Romantics, Mead argues, established "the existence of our self as the primary fact. That is what we insist upon. That is what gives the standard to values. In that situation the self puts itself forward as its ultimate reality" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 62). Thus, for the Romantics, knowledge of the self was not only possible, but was viewed as the highest form of knowledge.

At the heart of the Romantic preoccupation with self-consciousness was the question of the relation between subject and object. This question, we have seen, is also a central concern in Mead's ontology and epistemology. Philosophically, the Romantic analysis of the subject- object relation arose in relation to what Mead calls "the age-old problem of knowledge: How can one get any assurance that that which appears in our cognitive experience is real?" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 80). The early modern revolt of reason against authority had ended in a skepticism which, Mead writes, "shattered all the statements, all the doctrines, of the medieval philosophy. It had even torn to pieces the philosophy of the Renaissance. It had [with Hume's analysis of causation] shattered the natural structure of the world which the Renaissance science had presented in such simplicity and yet such majesty, that causal structure that led Kant to say that there were two things that overwhelmed him, the starry heavens above and the moral law within" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 80). The Romantics were reacting against this skeptical attitude. They approached the problem of knowledge from the standpoint of the self. The self, for the Romantics, was the pre-condition of experience; and experience, therefore, including the experience of objects, was to be understood in relation to the self. The epistemological problem of Romantic philosophy was to assimilate the not-self to the self, to encompass the objective world within the subjective world, to make the universe- at-large an intimate part of self-consciousness.

Self-consciousness, as was pointed out above, operates in the "reflexive mode." In self- consciousness, the self appears as both subject and object. We can be conscious of our consciousness. Mead points out that this reflexivity of consciousness is the foundation of Descartes' affirmation of the existence of the self. But Romantic self-consciousness goes beyond the Cartesian cogito in observing that "the self does not exist except in relation to something else" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 74). Self implies not-self; subject implies object. For every subject, there is an object; and for every object, there is a subject. "There cannot be one without the other" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 78).

The latter insight of Romantic thought is reflected, in a different form, in Mead's doctrine of perspectives. The Romantic view of the object as a constitutive element in experience marks a movement away from Cartesian subjectivism and toward the objectification of experience that occurs in Mead's perspectivism. "For Descartes, I am conscious and therefore exist; for the romanticist, I am conscious of myself and therefore this self, of which I am conscious, exists and with it the objects it knows. The object of knowledge, in this mode at least, is given as there with the same assurance that the thinker is given in the action of thought" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 83).

Romanticism, then, as Mead presents it, is not an extreme subjectivism. "The romantic attitude is rather the externalizing of the self. One projects one's self into the world, sees the world through the guise, the veil, of one's own emotions. That is the essential feature of the Romantic attitude" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 75). The world exists in relation to the self; but the world is (objectively) there as a necessary structure of human experience. Self and not-self, subject and object, are not contradictories, but dialectical polarities.

Another aspect of Romantic self-consciousness is the view that the self is a dynamic process. The polarity of self and not-self is not a static structure, but an ongoing relationship, "something that is going on" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 88)."The very existence of the self," Mead writes,

implies a not-self; it implies a not-self which can be identified with the self. You have seen that the term "self" is a reflexive affair. It involves an attitude of separation of the self from itself. Both subject and object are involved in the self in order that it may exist. The self must be identified, in some sense, with the not-self. It must be able to come back at itself from the outside. The process, then, as involved in the self is the subject-object process, a process within which both of these phases of experience lie, a process in which these different phases can be identified with each other — not necessarily as the same phase but at least as expressions of the same process (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 88).

The upshot of this point of view, according to Mead, is an activist or pragmatic conception of mind and knowledge. Knowing is a process involving the interaction of self and not-self. Knowledge is a result of a process in which the self takes action with reference to the not-self, in which the not-self is appropriated by the self. In this analysis of the Romantic epistemology, the germ of Mead's own "philosophy of the act" is apparent. The interaction of self and not-self is the foundation, not only of our knowledge of the world, but also of our knowledge of the self. Self-consciousness requires the objectification of the self. The Romantic elucidation of the polarity of self and not-self makes self-objectification (and therefore self- consciousness) theoretically comprehensible. In action toward the not-self, self-discovery becomes possible.

The world, according to Mead, "is organized only in so far as one acts in it. Its meaning lies in the conduct of the individual; and when one has built up his world as such a field of action, then he realizes himself as the individual who carried out that action. That is the only way in which he can achieve a self. One does not get at himself simply by turning upon himself the eye of introspection. One realizes himself in what he does, in the ends which he sets up, and in the means he takes to accomplish those ends" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 90). The world is a field of action. In this field, there are tasks to be accomplished; and it is through the accomplishing of tasks, through the appropriation of the not-self by the self, that the self is enlarged and actualized.

Thus, in Mead's analysis, philosophical Romanticism provides a theoretical description of the conditions under which self-consciousness is possible. The fundamental condition of self-consciousness, as we have seen, is self- objectification. However, for Mead, the basic process of self-objectification takes place in interpersonal experience. "We have to realize ourselves by taking the role of another, playing the part of another, taking the attitude of the community toward ourselves, continually seeing ourselves as others see us, regarding ourselves from the standpoint of those about us. This is not the self- consciousness that goes with awkwardness and uneasiness. It is the assured recognition of one's own position, one's social relations, that comes from being able to take the attitude of others toward ourselves" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 95). This interpretation of self- consciousness, which is the essence of Mead's theory of the self, has its roots in the Romantic analysis of the relation between self and not-self.

History and Romantic Self-Consciousness

There is a close connection between historical consciousness and self- consciousness in Romantic thought. The Romantic movement arose out of the failure of the bourgeois revolution. The hopes of the age of reason had not been realized, and the European was faced with a crisis in his sense of historical identity. Romantic consciousness, Mead argues, was a "discouraged" consciousness. In reaction to a disappointing present, the Romantics looked back to the Middle Ages for a model of life that carried with it a certain security. But the bourgeois revolution, for all its failures, had created a new concept of the individual. Post- revolutionary man "looked at himself as having his own rights, regarded himself as having his own feet to stand on." In the Romantic period, European man experienced himself as an individual. "This gave him a certain independence which he did not have before; it gave him a certain self- consciousness that he never had before" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 59-61). Thus,

Europe discovered the medieval period in the Romantic period . . . ; but it also discovered itself. In fact, it discovered itself first. Furthermore, it discovered the apparatus by means of which this self-discovery was possible. The self belongs to the reflexive mode. One senses the self only in so far as the self assumes the role of another so that it becomes both subject and object in the same experience. This is the thing of great importance in this whole historical movement (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 63).

The Romantic view of the Middle Ages, then, arose with reference to a problematic present and constituted an attempt on the part of European man to reconstruct the continuity of his experience. This reconstruction of historical time — which is, as suggested above, a collective time — resulted in the creation of a new sense of collective identity. The Romantic conception of the medieval past developed as an effort to redefine the self. European man had, in a sense, lost his self, and he turned to history in an attempt to recapture his sense of continuity. "What the Romantic period revealed, then, was not simply a past, but a past as the point of view from which to come back upon the self. One has to grow into the attitude of the other, come back to the self, to realize the self . . . . " (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 60).

Romanticism, in Mead's view, "is a reconstruction of the self through the self's assuming the roles of the great figures of the past" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 62). In placing oneself at the standpoint of others in the past, one can view oneself in a new light. Here, Mead reveals still another form of experience — historical experience — in which the self might be objectified. "That is, the self looked back at is own past as it found it in history. It looked back at it and gave the past a new form as that out of which it had sprung. It put itself back into the past. It lived over again the adventures and achievements of those old heroes with an interest which children have for the lives of their parents — taking their roles and realizing not only the past but the present itself in that process" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 69). In the Romantic search for the "historical connections" between past and present, a new past was created, and, with it, a new sense of "how the present had grown out of the past" emerged. History, viewed from the standpoint of Romantic self-consciousness, became the description of "an organized past" which rendered the problematic present of the Romantic period intelligible. Romantic self- consciousness turned to the past, reconstructed the past, and made the past one of the main foundations of the self. Romantic self-consciousness was thereby expanded and deepened through historical consciousness. We might say that the Romantic movement reconstructed western self-consciousness through a reconstruction of western historical consciousness.

The bourgeois revolution had sundered the connection between the past and present of early 19th century Europe and had left the future in question. It was the task of the Romantic movement to redefine European self- consciousness by way of a reconstruction of the continuity of historical time. In so doing, the Romantic movement revealed the present-directedness and future- directedness of historical consciousness and developed, by the way, an historically significant conception of the self as rooted in the experience of time.

c. History and the Idea of the Future

The idea of evolution is central in Mead's philosophy. For Mead, experience is fundamentally processual and temporal. Experience is the undergoing of change. Mead's entire ontology is an expression of evolutionary thinking. His concept of reality-as- process is ecological in structure and dynamic in content. Nature is a system of systems, a multiplicity of "transacting" fields and centers of activity. The relation between organism and environment (percipient event and consentient set) is mutual and dynamic. Both organism and environment are active: the activity of the organism alters the environment, and the activity of the environment alters the organism. There is no way of separating the two in reality, no way of telling which is primary and which secondary. Thus, Mead's employment of the concept of evolution is an aspect of his attempt to avoid the behavioristic and environmentalist determinism that would regard the organism as passive and as subject to the caprices of nature.

History as Evolution

Mead's concept of evolution is stated in social terms. In Mead's ontology, the entire realm of nature is described as social. The ontological principle of sociality is a fundamentally evolutionary concept that describes reality as a process in which percipient events adjust to new situations and adapt themselves to a variety of consentient sets.

Mind, as an emergent in the social act of communication, "lies inside of a process of conduct" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 345) and is temporally structured. Reflective intelligence is the peculiarly human way of overcoming the conflicts in experience; it is called into play when action is inhibited, and it has reference to a future situation in which the inhibition is overcome (Mind, Self and Society 90). And since, as we have seen, the reconstruction of the past is an important element in the temporal organization of human action, historical consciousness becomes a significant instrument in the human evolutionary process. Historical thought redefines the present in terms of a reinterpreted and reconstructed past and thereby facilitates passage into the future.

Human existence, then, is described by Mead in terms of evolution, temporality, and historicity. Human life involves a constant reconstruction of reality with reference to changing conditions and newly emergent situations. This process of evolutionary reconstruction, according to Mead, is evident in institutional change. The historical consciousness fostered by the Romantic movement has permitted us to view human institutions as "structures which arose in a process, and which simply expressed that process at a certain moment" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 149). For Mead, the ideas of process and structure do not exclude each other, but are related dialectically in actual historical developments. Historical thought, then, becomes one way of getting into "the structure, the movement, the current of the process" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 149).

Historical consciousness is a way of comprehending change. But it is also a way of fostering change; that is, by comprehending the direction of historical change, one can place oneself within a given current of change and pursue the historical success of that current. In this way, the historically minded individual or group can contribute to the development of new structures within the process of time. This, as Mead points out, is a way of "carrying over revolution into evolution" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 149).

Mead's conception of historical consciousness is rooted in his view of intelligence as the reconstruction of human experience in response to "new situations." As has been shown earlier, Mead views the novel event as the basis of intelligent conduct. "If there were no new situations, our conduct would be entirely habitual . . . . Conscious beings are those that are continually adjusting themselves, using their past experience, reconstructing their methods of conduct . . . . That is what intelligence consists in, not in finding out once and for all what the order of nature is and then acting in certain prescribed forms, but rather in continual readjustment" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 290). The historical resort to the past has reference to new situations that emerge in a present and that suggest a future. Human thought, including historical consciousness, is a confrontation with novelty and is aimed at passing from a problematic present to a non-problematic future. And the past is called in and reconstructed in relation to this project of coming to grips with the novelty of experience. "When what emerges is novel, the explanation of this novelty is sought in an order of events in the past which was not previously recognized" (Mead, "Relative Space-Time and Simultaneity" 529). Historical consciousness, as we have seen in the case of the Romantic movement, is instrumental in redefining and maintaining the temporal continuity of human experience.

Novelty, for Mead, is the foundation of consciousness, intelligence, and the freedom of conduct; it is the ground of human experience. "As far as experience is concerned, if everything novel were abandoned, experience itself would cease" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 290). Human experience is temporal, and, as such, it "involves the continual appearance of that which is new." Thus, "we are always advancing into a future which is different from the past" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 290). The future is open, and in acting toward the future, man becomes an active agent in the formulation of his own existence.

Although reality always exists in a present, the telos of this reality is to be found in the future. In Mead's view, the future is a factor, perhaps the main factor, in directing our conduct. It is the nature of intelligent conduct to be future-directed. "We are moving on, in the very nature of the case, in a process in which the past is moving into the present and into the future" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 509).

Human-directedness-toward-the-future is the foundation of freedom. The mechanistic view of the world is inadequate as an account of freedom; in fact, mechanism, since it denies the possibility of final causes and attempts to explain everything in terms of efficient causes, must deny the possibility of freedom. And yet, the "essence of conduct" is that "it is directed toward goals, ends which, while not yet actual, are operative in the determination of the directions which conduct shall take" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 317).

Goals, unlike efficient causes, are selected by the organism; and our selection of goals is not explicable (or predictable) on the basis of efficient causes. Thus, "the interpenetration of experience does go into the future. The essence of reality involves the future as essential to itself . . . . The coming of the future into our conduct is the very nature of our freedom" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 317).

Human action is action toward the future. The past does not determine (although it does condition) human conduct; it is, rather, human conduct that determines the past. Human action takes place in a present that opens on the future, and it is in terms of the emergent present and impending future that the content and meaning of the past are determined. Human acts are teleological rather than mechanical. Thus, as Strauss indicates, Mead's evolutionism permits him "to challenge mechanical conceptions of action and the world and to restate problems of autonomy, freedom and innovation in evolutionary and social rather than mechanistic and individualistic terms" (xviii).

The Ideal of History

Although Mead describes human existence as evolving toward an open future that cannot be prefigured with any finality, he does not ignore the fact that there are ideals that are operative in directing human action. "Cognizant of social realities and wary of utopian panaceas, [writes Reck,] resorting to the method of science in questions of morality rather than to authoritative religions or traditional customs, aware that men consist of impulses and instincts as well as of intelligence, Mead nevertheless discerned that there are ideal ends that operate as standards and goals for human conduct" ("Introduction" xl). That many of the ideal ends humans have pursued have been naive (that is, at odds with the realities of social and political life) is clear in Mead's criticism of the notions of liberty, equality, and fraternity. Attempts to convert such ideals into realities have often met with frustration in the ironies of history. It is for this reason that Mead argues that ideal ends, in some sense, must be grounded in historical reality; otherwise they become either fanciful wishes or mere ideological and rhetorical pronouncements.

Of the many ideals that have influenced human conduct, Mead selects one for special consideration: the ideal of the universal community. This ideal has appeared time and again in the history of human thought and is, in Mead's view, "the ideal or ultimate goal of human social progress" (Mind, Self and Society 310). The ideal of the universal community is, then, the ideal of history. According to this ideal, the goal of history is the establishment of "a society in which everyone is going to recognize the interests of everyone else," a society "in which the golden rule is to be the rule of conduct, that is, a society in which everyone is to make the interests of others his own interest" (Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century 362). The vision of the universal community is, in fact, the basis of the philosophy of history as a distinctive form of thought. "A philosophy of history arose as soon as men conceived that society was moving toward the realization of triumphant ends in some great far-off event. It became necessary to relate present conduct and transient values to the ultimate values toward which creation moved" (The Philosophy of the Act 504). This is the eschatological vision that is at the root of the historical conceptions of St. Paul, St. Augustine, Hegel, Marx, Herbert Spencer, and as we shall see, of Mead himself.

The ideal of the universal community is, however, "an abstraction" in as much as it is not actualized in the concrete world. In the life of the realities of political and social conflict (e.g., the conflict between private and public interests), the ideal of the universal community stands outside of history. And yet, this ideal is, in a sense, an historical ideal; that is, the ideal of the universal community, although not explicit in history, is, according to Mead, implicit in the historical process. The ideal is, on the one hand, operative in the hopes of mankind, and, on the other hand, it is potentially present in certain concrete historical forces. Among these historical forces, Mead finds three of particular importance: (1) the universal religions; (2) universal economic processes; and (3) the process of communication.

Both economic processes and universal religions tend toward a universal community. Religious and economic attitudes tend potentially toward "a social organization which goes beyond the actual structure in which individuals find themselves involved" (Mind, Self and Society 290). Commerce and love are both potentially universalizing ideas, and both have been significant factors in the development of human societies. The forces of exchange and love know no boundaries; all men are included (although abstractly) in the community of exchange and love. Although the religious attitude is a more profound form of identifying with others, the economic process, precisely because of its relative superficiality, "can travel more rapidly and make possible easier communication." "It is important to recognize," Mead writes, that these religious and economic developments toward a universal community are "going on in history" (Mind, Self and Society 296-197). That is, the movement toward a universal community is an immanent process and not merely an abstract idea. Human history seems to imply a universal community.

A third historical force that implies universality is the process of communication, to which Mead devotes so much of his attention in his various works. Language, as we have seen, is the matrix of social coordination. A linguistic gesture is an action which implies a response from another and which is dependent for its meaning on that response. The process of communication is a way of gesturing toward others, a way of transcending oneself, a way of taking the role of another. The linguistic act both presupposes and implies a human community of unspecified and unlimited extension.

"Language," according to Mead, "provides a universal community which is something like the economic community" (Mind, Self and Society 283). It is through significant communication that the individual is able to generalize her experience to include the experiences of others. The world of "thought and reason" that emerges out of the social act of communication is, almost by definition, transpersonal and therefore verges toward the universal. Social organization and social interaction require a commonality of meaning, a "universe of discourse," within which individual acts can take on significance (Mind, Self and Society 89-90). The process of significant communication is the source of this universe of discourse.

It is Mead's contention that "the thought world" created in significant communication constitutes the widest of human communities to date. The group "defined by the logical universe of discourse" is that which is the most general of all human groups — the one that "claims the largest number of individual members." This group is based on "the universal functioning of gestures as significant symbols in the general human social process of communication" (Mind, Self and Society 157-158). This universalizing tendency of language comes closer to the realization of the ideal community than do the religious and economic attitudes. These latter, moreover, actually presuppose the communicational process: religion and economics organize themselves as social acts on the basis of communication.

Mead thus states the ideal of history in primarily communicational terms:

The human social ideal . . . is the attainment of a universal human society in which all human individuals would possess a perfected social intelligence, such that all social meanings would each be similarly reflected in their respective individual consciousnesses — such that the meanings of any one individual's acts or gestures (as realized by him and expressed in the structure of his self, through his ability to take the social attitudes of other individuals toward himself and toward their common social ends or purposes) would be the same for any other individual whatever who responded to them(Mind, Self and Society 310).

Mead's vision seems to imply a society of many personalities (Mind, Self and Society 324-325) in perfect communication with one another. Every person would be capable of putting herself into the place of every other person. Such a system of perfect communication, in which the meanings of all symbols are fully transparent, would realize the ideal of a universal human community.

Mead recognizes, of course, how far we are from realizing the universal community. Our religions, our economic systems, and our communicational processes are severely limited. At present, these historical forces separate us as much as they unite us. All three, for example, are conditioned by another historical force which has a fragmenting rather than a universalizing effect on modern culture, namely, nationalism (see Mead, Selected Writings 355- 370). Mead points out that "the limitation of social organization is found in the inability of individuals to place themselves in the perspectives of others, to take their points of view" (The Philosophy of the Present 165). This limitation is far from overcome in contemporary life. And "the ideal human society cannot exist as long as it is impossible for individuals to enter into the attitudes of those whom they are affecting in the performance of their particular functions" (Mind, Self and Society 328). Contemporary culture is a world culture; we all affect each other politically, culturally, economically. Nonetheless, "the actual society in which universality can get its expression has not risen" (Mind, Self and Society 267).

But it is also true that the ideal of the universal community is present by implication in our religions, in our economic systems, and in our communicational acts. The ideal is there as a directive in human history. It implies an evolution toward an ideal goal and informs our conduct accordingly.

Mead's social idealism is not utopian, but historical. The ideal of history, the ideal of the universal community, is "an ideal of method, not of program. It indicates direction, not destination" (The Philosophy of the Act 519). And in so far as this ideal informs our actual conduct in the historical world, it is a concrete rather than an abstract universal (The Philosophy of the Act 518-519). The ideal of history is both transcendent and immanent; it is rooted in the past and present, but leads into the future which is always awaiting realization.

Historical thought, then, for Mead, is instrumental in the evolution of human society. It is through the constant reconstruction of experience that human intelligence and human society are expanded. Mead's evolutionary conception of human history is clearly a progressive notion which he seeks to document throughout his writings. There is implicit in human history a tendency toward a larger and larger sense of community. The ultimate formulation of this historical tendency is found in the ideal of the universal community. This ideal is not purely abstract (that is, extra-historical), but is rooted in actual historical forces such as the universal religions, modern economic forces, and the human communicational process. According to Mead, it is this ideal of the universal community that informs the human evolutionary process and that indicates the implicit direction or teleology of history.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources


  • Mind, Self, and Society, ed. C.W. Morris (University of Chicago 1934)
  • Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century, ed. M.H. Moore (University of Chicago 1936)
  • The Philosophy of the Act, ed. C.W. Morris et al. (University of Chicago 1938).
  • The Philosophy of the Present, ed. A.E. Murphy (Open Court 1932)
  • Selected Writings, ed. A.J. Reck (Bobbs-Merrill, Liberal Arts Press, 1964).


  • "A Behavioristic Account of the Significant Symbol," Journal of Philosophy, 19 (1922): 157-63.
  • "Bishop Berkeley and his Message," Journal of Philosophy, 26 (1929): 421- 30.
  • "Concerning Animal Perception," Psychological Review, 14 (1907): 383- 90.
  • "Cooley's Contribution to American Social Thought," American Journal of Sociology, 35 (1930): 693-706.
  • "The Definition of the Psychical," Decennial Publications of the U. of Chicago, 1st Series, Vol. III (1903): 77-112.
  • "The Genesis of the Self and Social Control," International Journal of Ethics, 35 (1925), pp. 251-77.
  • "Image or Sensation," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Method, 1 (1904): 604-7.
  • "The Imagination in Wundt's Treatment of Myth and Religion," Psychological Bulletin, 3 (1906): 393-9.
  • "Josiah Royce - A Personal Impression," International Journal of Ethics, 27 (1917): 168-70.
  • "The Mechanism of Social Consciousness," J. of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods, 9 (1912): 401-6.
  • "National-Mindedness and International-Mindedness," International Journal of Ethics, 39 (1929): 385-407.
  • "Natural Rights and the Theory of the Political Institution," Journal of Philosophy, 12 (1915): 141-55.
  • "The Nature of Aesthetic Experience," International Journal of Ethics, 36 (1925-1926): 382-93.
  • "The Nature of the Past," in Essays in Honor of John Dewey, ed. by J. Coss (Henry Holt 1929): 235-42.
  • "A New Criticism of Hegelianism: Is It Valid?," American Journal of Theology, 5 (1901): 87-96.
  • "The Objective Reality of Perspectives," Proceedings of the 6th Internat'l Congress of Philosophy (1926): 75-85.
  • "The Philosophical Basis of Ethics," International Journal of Ethics, 18 (1908): 311-23.
  • "A Pragmatic Theory of Truth," in University of California Publications in Philosophy, 11 (1929): 65-88.
  • "The Psychology of Social Consciousness Implied in Instruction," Science, 31 (1910): 688-93.
  • "The Relation of Play to Education," University of Chicago Record, 1 (1896): 140-5.
  • "The Relation of Psychology and Philology," Psychological Bulletin, 1 (1904): 375-91.
  • "Relative Space-Time and Simultaneity," ed. D.L. Miller, Review of Metaphysics, 17 (1964): 511-535.
  • "Royce, James, & Dewey in Their American Setting," Internat'l Journal of Ethics, 40 (1929): 211-31.
  • "Scientific Method & the Individual Thinker," in Creative Intelligence, ed. J. Dewey et al. (Holt 1917): 176-227.
  • "Scientific Method and the Moral Sciences," International Journal of Ethics, 33 (1923), pp. 229-47.
  • "Social Consciousness and the Consciousness of Meaning," Psychological Bulletin, 7 (1910): 397-405.
  • "Social Psychology as Counterpart to Physiological Psychology," Psychological Bulletin, 6 (1909): 401-8.
  • "The Social Self," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods, 10 (1913): 374-80.
  • "Suggestions Towards a Theory of the Philosophical Disciplines," Philosophical Review, 9 (1900): 1-17.
  • "A Theory of Emotions from the Physiological Standpoint," Psychological Review (1895): 162-4.
  • "A Translation of Wundt's 'Folk Psychology'," American Journal of Theology, 23 (1919): 533-36.
  • "What Social Objects Must Psychology Presuppose?," J. of Phil., Psych. & Scientific Methods, 7 (1910): 174-80.
  • "The Working Hypothesis in Social Reform," American Journal of Sociology, 5 (1899): 367-71.

b. Secondary Sources (click on "Commentaries").

The following is a selection of books and articles that I have found especially helpful in my own work on Mead.


  • Aboulafia, Mitchell. The Mediating Self: Mead, Sartre and Self- Determination (Yale 1986).
  • Aboulafia, Mitchell (ed.). Philosophy, Social Theory and the Thought of George Herbert Mead (SUNY 1991).
  • Baldwin, John D. George Herbert Mead: A Unifying Theory for Sociology, (Sage 1986).
  • Cook, Gary A. George Herbert Mead: The Making of a Social Pragmatist (University of Illinois 1993).
  • Corti, Walter Robert (ed.), The Philosophy of G.H. Mead (Amriswiler Bucherei [Switzerland] 1973).
  • Goff, Thomas. Marx and Mead: Contributions to a Sociology of Knowledge (Routledge 1980).
  • Hamilton, Peter. George Herbert Mead: Critical Assessments (Routledge 1993).
  • Hanson, Karen. The Self Imagined: Philosophical Reflections on the Social Character of Psyche (Routledge 1987).
  • Joas, Hans. G.H. Mead: A Contemporary Re-Examination of His Thought (MIT Press 1997).
  • Joas, Hans. Pragmatism and Social Theory (University of Chicago 1993).
  • Miller, David L. G.H. Mead. Self, Language, and the World (University of Chicago 1973).
  • Morris, Charles. Signification and Significance: A Study of the Relations of Signs and Values (MIT Press 1964).
  • Morris, Charles. Signs, Language, and Behavior (Prentice-Hall 1946).
  • Natanson, Maurice. The Social Dynamics of George H. Mead (Public Affairs Press 1956).
  • Pfeutze, Paul E. Self, Society, Existence: George Herbert Mead and Martin Buber (Harper 1961).
  • Rosenthal, Sandra. Mead and Merleau-Ponty: Toward a Common Vision (SUNY 1991).
  • Rucker, Darnell. The Chicago Pragmatists (University of Minnesota Press 1969).


  • Aboulafia, Mitchell. "Mead, Sartre: Self, Object & Reflection," Philosophy & Social Criticism, 11 (1986): 63-86.
  • Aboulafia, Mitchell. "Habermas and Mead: On Universality and Individuality," Constellations, 2 (1995): 95-113.
  • Ames, Van Meter. "Buber and Mead," Antioch Review, 27 (1967): 181-91.
  • Ames, Van Meter. "Zen to Mead," Proceedings and Addresses of the Amer. Phil. Assn., 33 (1959-1960): 27-42.
  • Ames, Van Meter. "Mead & Husserl on the Self," Philosophy & Phenomenological Research, 15 (1955): 320-31.
  • Ames, Van Meter. "Mead and Sartre on Man," Journal of Philosophy, 53 (1956): 205-19.
  • Baldwin, John D. "G.H. Mead & Modern Behaviorism," Pacific Sociological Review, 24 (1981): 411-40.
  • Batiuk, Mary-Ellen. "Misreading Mead: Then and Now," Contemporary Sociology, 11 (1982): 138-40.
  • Baumann, Bedrich. "George H. Mead and Luigi Pirandello," Social Research, 34 (1967): 563-607.
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Author Information

George Cronk
Bergen Community College
U. S. A.

Maurice Merleau-Ponty (1908—1961)

merleau-pontyMaurice Merleau-Ponty’s work is commonly associated with the philosophical movement called existentialism and its intention to begin with an analysis of the concrete experiences, perceptions, and difficulties, of human existence. However, he never propounded quite the same extreme accounts of radical freedom, being-towards-death, anguished responsibility, and conflicting relations with others, for which existentialism became both famous and notorious in the 1940s and 1950s. Perhaps because of this, he did not initially receive the same amount of attention as his French contemporaries and friends, Jean-Paul Sartre and Simone de Beauvoir. These days though, his phenomenological analyses are arguably being given more attention than either, in both France and in the Anglo-American context, because they retain an ongoing relevance in fields as diverse as cognitive science, medical ethics, ecology, sociology and psychology. Although it is difficult to summarize Merleau-Ponty’s work into neat propositions, we can say that he sought to develop a radical re-description of embodied experience (with a primacy given to studies of perception), and argued that these phenomena could not be suitably understood by the philosophical tradition because of its tendency to drift between two flawed and equally unsatisfactory alternatives: empiricism and, what he called, intellectualism. This article will seek to explain his understanding of perception, bodily movement, habit, ambiguity, and relations with others, as they were expressed in his key early work, Phenomenology of Perception, before exploring the enigmatic ontology of the chiasm and the flesh that is so evocatively described in his unfinished book, The Visible and the Invisible.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Early Philosophy
    1. Habit
    2. Philosophy and Reflection
    3. Ambiguity
  3. Later Philosophy
    1. The Critique of the Phenomenology of Perception
    2. The Chiasm/Reversibility
    3. The Other
    4. Hyper-Reflection
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Writings
    2. Some Commentaries and Collections of Essays

1. Life and Works

Maurice Merleau-Ponty was born on March 14th 1908, and like many others of his generation, his father was killed in World War I. He completed his philosophy education at the Ecole Normale Superieure in 1930, and rather rapidly became one of the foremost French philosophers of the period during, and immediately following World War II, where he also served in the infantry. As well as being Chair of child psychology at Sorbonne in 1949, he was the youngest ever Chair of philosophy at the College de France when he was awarded this position in 1952. He continued to fulfill this role until his untimely death in 1961, and was also a major contributor for the influential political, literary, and philosophical magazine that was Les Temps Modernes. While he repeatedly refused to be explicitly named as an editor alongside his friend and compatriot Jean-Paul Sartre, he was at least as important behind the scenes.

Along with Sartre, he has frequently been associated with the philosophical movement existentialism, though he never propounded quite the same extreme accounts of freedom, anguished responsibility, and conflicting relations with others, for which existentialism became both famous and notorious. Indeed, he spent much of his career contesting and reformulating many of Sartre's positions, including a sustained critique of what he saw as Sartre's dualist and Cartesian ontology. He also came to disagree with Sartre's rather hard-line Marxism, and this was undoubtedly a major factor in what was eventually a rather acrimonious ending to their friendship. For Merleau-Ponty's assessment of their differences see Adventures of the Dialectic, but for Sartre's version of events, see Situations. While he died before completing his final opus that sought to completely reorient philosophy and ontology (The Visible and the Invisible), his work retains an importance to contemporary European philosophy. Having been one of the first to bring structuralism and the linguistic emphasis of thinkers like Saussure into a relationship with phenomenology, his influence is still considerable, and an increasing amount of scholarship is being devoted to his works.

His philosophy was heavily influenced by the work of Husserl, and his own particular brand of phenomenology was preoccupied with refuting what he saw as the twin tendencies of Western philosophy; those being empiricism, and what he termed intellectualism, but which is more commonly referred to as idealism. He sought to rearticulate the relationship between subject and object, self and world, among various other dualisms, and his early and middle work did so primarily through an account of the lived and existential body (see The Phenomenology of Perception). He argued that the significance of the body, or the body-subject as he sometimes referred to it, is too often underestimated by the philosophical tradition which has a tendency to consider the body simply as an object that a transcendent mind orders to perform varying functions. In this respect, his work was heavily based upon accounts of perception, and tended towards emphasizing an embodied inherence in the world that is more fundamental than our reflective capacities, though he also claims that perception is itself intrinsically cognitive. His work is often associated with the idea of the 'primacy of perception', though rather than rejecting scientific and analytic ways of knowing the world, Merleau-Ponty simply wanted to argue that such knowledge is always derivative in relation to the more practical exigencies of the body's exposure to the world.

2. Early Philosophy

When asked whether he was contemplating retirement on account of illness and the ravages of advancing age, Pope John Paul II confirmed that he was, and bemoaned the fact that his body was no longer a docile instrument, but a cage. Although it is difficult to deny that a docile body that can be used instrumentally might be preferable to its decaying alternative--a body that prevents us acting as we might wish to--both positions are united by a very literal adherence to the mind-body duality, and the subordination of one term of that duality; the body. Of course, such a dualistic way of thinking, and the denunciation of the body that it usually entails, is certainly not restricted to religious traditions. This denigration of embodiment governs most metaphysical thought, and perhaps even most philosophical thought, until at least Nietzsche. Even Heidegger's philosophy has been accused of deferring the question of the body, and a non-dualistic exploration of our embodied experience seems to be a project of some importance, and it is one that preoccupied Maurice Merleau-Ponty throughout his entire career.

While a major figure in French phenomenology, Merleau-Ponty, at least until relatively recently, has rarely been accorded the amount of attention of many of his compatriots. In my opinion, this has been a considerable oversight, as it is doubtful that any other philosopher, phenomenologist or otherwise, has ever paid such sustained attention to the significance of the body in relation to the self, to the world, and to others. There is no relation or aspect of his phenomenology which does not implicate the body, or what he terms the body-subject (which is later considered in terms of his more general notion of the flesh), and significantly, his descriptions allow us to reconceive the problem of embodiment in terms of the body's practical capacity to act, rather than in terms of any essential trait.

In the Phenomenology of Perception, which is arguably his major work, Merleau-Ponty sets about exposing the problematic nature of traditional philosophical dichotomies and, in particular, that apparently age-old dualism involving the mind and the body. It is no accident that consideration of this dualism plays such an important role in all of his work, since the constitution of the body as an 'object' is also a pivotal moment in the construction of the idea of an objective world which exists 'out there' (PP 72). Once this conception of the body is problematized, so too, according to Merleau-Ponty, is the whole idea of an outside world that is entirely distinguishable from the thinking subject.

Merleau-Ponty criticizes the tendency of philosophy to fall within two main categories, neither of which is capable of shedding much light on the problems that it seeks to address. He is equally critical of the rationalist, Cartesian accounts of humanity, as well as the more empirical and behavioristic attempts to designate the human condition.

Rationalism is problematic because it ignores our situation, and consequently the contingent nature of thought, when it makes the world, or at least meaning, the immanent property of the reflecting mind. One quote from Descartes is illustrative of this type of attitude:

"If I chance to look out of the window onto men passing in the street, I do not fail to say, on seeing them, that I see men... and yet, what do I see from this window, other than hats and cloaks, which cover ghosts or dummies who move only by means of springs? But I judge them to be really men, and thus I understand, by the sole power of judgment that resides in my mind, what I believed I saw with my eyes" (Crossley 10).

Descartes' prioritizing of the mental above the physical (and indeed the duality itself), is very obvious here and this is something that Merleau-Ponty strongly rejects. As well as being unjust to existential experience, it also leaves the problem of meaningful judgment untouched. The account presupposes the meaningful judgment of hats and cloaks, rather than explaining how this perception could actually be meaningful. We shall return to such criticisms of Cartesianism throughout this chapter, but for the time being it is more important for us to have an accurate understanding of where Merleau-Ponty situates his philosophy, than it is for us to have a systematic comprehension of exactly why he refutes rationalism, or what he terms intellectualism.

According to Merleau-Ponty, empiricism also makes our cultural world an illusion, by ignoring the internal connection between the object and the act. For him, perception is not merely the result of the functioning of individual organs, but also a vital and performative human act in which "I" perceive through the relevant organs. Each of the senses informs the others in virtue of their common behavioral project, or concern with a certain human endeavor, and perception is inconceivable without this complementary functioning. Empiricism generally ignores this, and Merleau-Ponty contends that whatever their efficacy in explaining certain phenomena, these type of scientific and analytic causalities cannot actually appraise meaning and human action. As one critic points out, "if we attempt to localize and sectionalize the various activities which manifest themselves at the bodily level, we lose the signification of the action itself" (Barral 94). In the terms of Merleau-Ponty's later philosophy, such an analysis would "recuperate everything except itself as an effort of recuperation, it would clarify everything except its own role" (VI 33).

The main point to extract from this is that, for Merleau-Ponty, both empiricism and intellectualism are eminently flawed positions:

"In the first case consciousness is too poor, in the second too rich for any phenomenon to appeal compellingly to it. Empiricism cannot see that we need to know what we are looking for, otherwise we would not be looking for it, and intellectualism fails to see that we need to be ignorant of what we are looking for, or equally again we should not be searching" (PP 28).

It is not difficult to see why Merleau-Ponty would be preoccupied with undermining such dichotomous tendencies. Essentially it ensures that one exists as a constituting thing (subject) or as a thing (object). Moreover, that perennial philosophical debate regarding whether humanity is free or determined is more than tangentially related, and all of these issues seem to be inextricably intertwined in what Foucault aptly terms the "empirico-transcendental doublet of modern thought." This ontological dualism of immanence and transcendence - see mind/body, thought/language, self/world, inside/outside - is at the forefront of all of Merleau-Ponty's attempts to re-orientate philosophy.

While Merleau-Ponty does not want to simplistically deny the possibility of cognitive relations between subject and object, he does want to repudiate the suggestion that these facts are phenomenologically primitive. It may be useful, in a particular situation, to conceive of a seer and a seen, a subject and an object. Many scientific endeavors fruitfully rely upon the methodological ideal of a detached consciousness observing brute facts about the world. Merleau-Ponty can accommodate this, provided that the terms of such dualities are recognized to be relationally constituted. In other words, for him, the seer and the seen condition one another and, of course, there is an obvious sense in which our capacity for seeing does depend on our capacity for being seen - that is, being physically embodied in what Merleau-Ponty has occasionally described as an 'inter-individual' world.

In this repudiation of traditional metaphysical philosophy and its governing subject-object relationship, it is perhaps unsurprising that Merleau-Ponty, when speaking of his phenomenological method, suggests that "the demand for a pure description excludes equally the procedure of analytical reflection on the one hand, and that of scientific explanation on the other" (PP ix). Only by avoiding these tendencies, according to him, can we "rediscover, as anterior to the ideas of subject and object, the fact of my subjectivity and the nascent object, that primordial layer at which both things and ideas come into being" (PP 219).

The Phenomenology of Perception is hence united by the claim that we are our bodies, and that our lived experience of this body denies the detachment of subject from object, mind from body, etc (PP xii). In this embodied state of being where the ideational and the material are intimately linked, human existence cannot be conflated into any particular paradigm, for as Nick Crossley suggests, "there is no meaning which is not embodied, nor any matter that is not meaningful" (Crossley 14). It should be clear from this that Merleau-Ponty's statement that 'I am my body' cannot simply be interpreted as advocating a materialist, behaviorist type position. He does not want to deny or ignore those aspects of our life which are commonly called the 'mental' - and what would be left if he did? - but he does want to suggest that the use of this 'mind' is inseparable from our bodily, situated, and physical nature. This means simply that the perceiving mind is an incarnated body, or to put the problem in another way, he enriches the concept of the body to allow it to both think and perceive. It is also for these reasons that we are best served by referring to the individual as not simply a body, but as a body-subject.

Virtually the entirety of the Phenomenology of Perception is devoted to illustrating that the body cannot be viewed solely as an object, or material entity of the world. Perception has been a prominent theme in Merleau-Ponty's attempts to establish this, and even in his latest work, he still holds its primacy as our clearest relationship to Being, and in which the inadequacy of dualistic thinking is most explicitly revealed. However, despite the titles of two of his major works (Phenomenology of Perception and The Primacy of Perception), perception, at least as the term is usually construed, is paradoxically enough, not really a guiding principle in his work. This is because the practical modes of action of the body-subject are inseparable from the perceiving body-subject (or at least mutually informing), since it is precisely through the body that we have access to the world. Perception hence involves the perceiving subject in a situation, rather than positioning them as a spectator who has somehow abstracted themselves from the situation. There is hence an interconnection of action and perception, or as Merleau-Ponty puts it, "every perceptual habituality is still a motor habit" (PP 153).

This ensures that there is no lived distinction between the act of perceiving and the thing perceived. This will become clearer in his later philosophy, where the figure of the chiasm becomes an important ontological motif for explaining how and why this is the case. At this stage however, it suffices to recognize that for Merleau-Ponty, "in the natural attitude, I do not have perceptions" (PP 281). Moreover, in the "Working Notes" of his final, unfinished work, The Visible and the Invisible, he states that "we exclude the term perception to the whole extent that it already implies a cutting up of what is lived into discontinuous acts, or a reference to things whose status is not specified, or simply an opposition between the visible and the invisible" (VI 157-8). Hence, as Gary Madison has pointed out, "what traditionally has been referred to as 'perception', no longer figures in Merleau-Ponty's post-foundationalist mode of thinking" (MPHP 83). To the degree that we can actually speak of Merleau-Ponty's account of perception, it essentially suggests the same thing as the rest of his work (and despite the incredible breadth and perspicacity of his work, one cannot deny that the Phenomenology of Perception is repetitious); it criticizes our tendency to bifurcate between two positions. Merleau-Ponty suggests that;

"We started off from a world in itself which acted upon our eyes so as to cause us to see it, and now we have consciousness of, or thought about the world, but the nature of the world remains unchanged; it is still defined by the absolute mutual exteriority of its parts, and is merely duplicated throughout its extent by a thought which sustains it" (PP 39).

In other words, the common perceptual paradigm that involves passively seeing something and then interpreting that biological perception is, for Merleau-Ponty, a false one. The presumption is still that one exists either as a thing, or as a consciousness (PP 198), but the perceiving body-subject conforms to neither of this positions; its mode of existence is manifestly more complicated and ambiguous. As hard as we may try, we cannot see the broken shards of a beer bottle as simply the sum of its color, shape etc. The whole background apparatus of what that bottle is used for, what consuming the liquids contained therein means for different people, what it is for something to be 'broken' etc, comes with, and not behind, our perception of that bottle. For Merleau-Ponty, perception cannot be characterized as a type of thought in a classical, reflective sense, but equally clearly, it is also far from being a third person process where we attain access to some rarefied, pure object. Just as for Heidegger we cannot hear pure noise but always a noise of some activity, the objects that we encounter in the world are always of a particular kind and relevant to certain human intentions (explicit or otherwise), and we cannot step outside this instrumentality to some realm of purified objects or, for that matter, thought.

Perception then, is not merely passive before sensory stimulation, but as Merleau-Ponty suggests, is a "creative receptivity". In this respect, it is interesting to observe that our modern vernacular incorporates this more 'active' and appropriative dimension of perception. After all, one is often commended for 'perceptive' observations, and for this to function as a compliment at all, it must admit of an individual's creative influence, and hence some responsibility, over the manner in which they perceive.

More empirically, it is also worth pointing out that if we were merely passive before a sensory image, it would not be possible to see different aspects of things as we so often do, or for that matter, for different individuals to construe a particular representation differently. Consider Jastrow's/Wittgenstein's famous example in which a picture can be variously interpreted as a duck or a rabbit, or the prominent psychological diagram that highlights the capacity of an individual to see a vase at one moment and two faces confronting one another at the next, depending upon which part of the diagram they determine to be the background. These experiential studies seem to reinforce Merleau-Ponty's fundamental point that we are not simply passive before sensorial stimulation, since the visual experience seems to change, and yet nothing changes optically with respect to color, shape or distance. What we literally see, or notice, is hence not simply the objective world, but is conditioned by a myriad of factors that ensures that the relationship between perceiving subject and object perceived is not one of exclusion. Rather, each term exists only through its dialectical relation to the other, and from this analysis of the perceiving body-subject, Merleau-Ponty enigmatically concludes that "Inside and outside are inseparable. The world is wholly inside and I am wholly outside myself" (PP 407).

For Merleau-Ponty, this inseparability of inner and outer ensures that a study of the perceived ends up revealing the subject perceiving. As he puts it, "the body will draw to itself the intentional threads which bind it to its surroundings and finally will reveal to us the perceiving subject as the perceived world" (PP). It is precisely this ambiguous intertwining of inner and outer, as it is revealed in a phenomenological analysis of the body, which the intellectualism of philosophy cannot appreciate. According to Merleau-Ponty, philosophers of reflection ignore the paradoxical condition of all human subjectivity: that is, the fact that we are both a part of the world and coextensive with it, constituting but also constituted (PP 453).

However, if perception is not grounded in either an objective or subjective component (for example, it is not objectively received before a subjective interpretation), but by a reciprocal openness which resides between such categories, it may be remarked that this would seem to endow perception with an instability that it clearly doesn't have. Merleau-Ponty's philosophy has the means to cater for this stability though.

His analysis of the body's tendency to seek an equilibrium through skilful coping, or what he somewhat problematically terms "habituality," affirms how perception is learnt, primarily through imitation, in an embodied and communal environment. While perception is subject to change, just as communities can change over periods of time, this possibility certainly does not allow for wild fluctuations in perceptive experience from one moment to the next. Habit, and the production of schemes in regards to the body's mobilization, "gives our life the form of generality and prolongs our personal acts into stable dispositions" (PP 146). This tendency of our body to seek its own equilibrium and to form habits, is an infinitely important component of Merleau-Ponty's body-subject, and it is a theme that we will return to.

For the moment however, we must return to other manifestations of Merleau-Ponty's argument for the body-subject. Another idea of central significance for him is the fact that the body is always there, and that its absence (and to a certain degree also its variation) is inconceivable (PP 91). It means that we cannot treat the body as an object available for perusal, which can or cannot be part of our world, since it is not something that we can possibly do with out. It is the mistake of classical psychology, not to mention the empiricism of all sciences, that it treats the body as an object, when for Merleau-Ponty, an object "is an object only insofar as it can be moved away from me... Its presence is such that it entails a possible absence. Now the permanence of my body is entirely different in kind" (PP 90). It is inordinately difficult to fault this claim that the omnipresence of our body prevents us treating it simply as an object of the world, even though such an apparently axiomatic position is not always recognized by traditional philosophy, as we have already seen exemplified by both Descartes, and Pope John Paul II.

Another factor against conceiving of the body as being completely constituted, and an object in-itself, is the fact that it is that by which there are objects. Our motility, that is, our capability of bodily movement, testifies that the body cannot be the mere servant of consciousness, since "in order that we may be able to move our body towards an object, the object must first exist for it, our body must not belong to the realm of the in-itself" (PP 139). This Sartrean term will be accorded with more significance as we progress, but for the moment, one only need see that Merleau-Ponty is making explicit that the aspects of an object revealed to an individual are dependent upon their bodily position.

For him, it is also clear that we are not accorded quite the same privilege in viewing our own bodies, as we have in viewing other 'objects'. For Merleau-Ponty, this is because "the presentation of objects in perspective cannot be understood except through the resistance of my body to all variation of perspective" (PP 92). We cannot see our body as the other does, and as Merleau-Ponty says, "the reflection of the body upon itself always miscarries at the last minute" (VI 9). I think it is relatively clear that we do need the other to attain to true awareness of ourselves as a body-subject. Even our vision of ourselves in a mirror is always mediated by body image, and hence by the other, and it would seem that we can't look at our own mirror image in quite the same way that we can appreciate the appearance of others. These more existential aspects of our existence suggest that there is something fundamentally true about Merleau-Ponty's more general suggestion that our body should be conceived of as our means of communication with the world, rather than merely as an object of the world which our transcendent mind orders to perform varying functions.

Merleau-Ponty offers one particularly good example of the body as a means of communication, which also makes it clear that a subject-object model of exchange tends to deprive the existential phenomena of their true complexity. He suggests that:

"If I touch with my left hand my right hand while it touches an object, the right hand object is not the right hand touching: the first is an intertwining of bones, muscles and flesh bearing down on a point in space, the second traverses space as a rocket in order to discover the exterior object in its place" (PP 92).

More significantly, the hand touching itself represents the body's capacity to occupy the position of both perceiving object and subject of perception, if not at once, then in a constant oscillation. However, as he puts it, "when I press my two hands together, it is not a matter of two sensations felt together as one perceives two objects placed side by side, but an ambiguous set-up in which both hands can alternate the role of 'touching' and being 'touched'" (PP 93). Mark Yount expresses Merleau-Ponty's point well, when he suggests that "the reflexivity of this touching-touched exceeds the logic of dichotomy: the two are not entirely distinguished, since the roles can be reversed; but the two are not identical, since touching and touched can never fully coincide" (MPHP 216-7). This double touching and encroachment of the touching onto the touched (and vice versa), where subject and object cannot be unequivocally discerned, is considered to be representative of perception and sensibility generally. Pre-empting the more explicit ontology of The Visible and the Invisible (and with which we shall become increasingly concerned), Merleau-Ponty hence tacitly argues for the "reversibility" of the body, its capacity to be both sentient and sensible, and reaffirms his basic contention that incarnate consciousness is the central phenomena of which mind and body are abstract moments (PP 193).

a. Habit

However, Merleau-Ponty has another vitally important and related point to make about the status of our bodies, which precludes them from being categorized simply as objects. According to him, we move directly and in union with our bodies. As he points out, "I do not need to lead it (the body) towards a movement's completion, it is in contact with it from the start and propels itself towards that end" (PP 94, my italics). In other words, we do not need to check to see if we have two legs before we stand up, since we are necessarily with our bodies. The consequences of this simple idea however, are more extensive than one may presume.

On a more complicated level, the sporting arena testifies to this being with our bodies, as does the wave, or other gesture, that simply responds to given circumstances without the intervention of traditional philosophical conceptions of thought and/or intention. For instance, the basketball player who says that they are "in the zone" perceives the terrain in accordance with some general intentions, but these are modified by the situation in which they find themselves. Their actions are solicited by the situations that confront them, in a constantly evolving way.

Interestingly enough, in The Structure of Behavior, Merleau-Ponty also makes use of a sporting analogy. He suggests that:

"For the player in action the football field is not an 'object', that is, the ideal term which can give rise to a multiplicity of perspectival views and remain equivalent under its apparent transformations. It is pervaded with lines of force (the 'yard lines'; those which demarcate the penalty area) and articulated in sectors (for example, the 'openings' between the adversaries) which call for a certain mode of action and which initiate and guide the action as if the player were unaware of it. The field itself is not given to him, but present as the immanent term of his practical intentions; the player becomes one with it and feels the direction of the goal, for example just as immediately as the vertical and horizontal planes of his own body" (SB 168).

This passage implies that to perceive the football pitch it is not necessary that an individual be aware of perceiving it, but this is not the only significance of this revealed mode of being. The perceptions/actions of the sportsperson reveal a form of intelligence that informs much of our everyday interaction, and that refutes many dichotomous positions (PP 142), most obvious among these being the insistence that a separate act of interpretation (to determine a goal or intention), is necessary to give action a meaningful form. Moreover, Merleau-Ponty's descriptions of sporting activity also imply that as we refine our skills for coping with existence (based upon past experiences), scenarios show up as soliciting those acquired skilful responses, and it is this aspect of his work that attracts Hubert Dreyfus' attention. For Dreyfus, this "skilful coping does not require a mental representation of its goal. It can be purposive without the agent entertaining a purpose" and this pre-reflective mode of existence reveals many of the postulations of dualistic thinking as abstractions.

Moreover, if this purposive action without a purpose (other than best accommodating oneself to the situation in which one is immersed), is forestalled, say if a particular golfer starts to ponder the intricacies of their swing, where their feet are positioned, mental outlook etc, rather than simply responding, it is certainly probable that they will lose form. So what, one may ask? According to Merleau-Ponty, the point is that "whether a system of motor or perceptual powers, our body is not an object for an 'I think', it is a grouping of lived-through meanings which moves towards its equilibrium" (PP 153). The emphasis upon rationalistic thought, and its tendency to dissect human behavior through the 'I think', can conspire to turn us away from the body's acclimatization to it's own environment. Merleau-Ponty hence seems to explore a more basic motivation for human action than is usually taken to be the case. Rather than focusing upon our desire to attain certain pleasures or achieve certain goals, his analysis reveals the body's more primordial tendency to form intentional arcs, and to try and achieve an equilibrium with the world.

Through reference to embodied activity, Merleau-Ponty makes it clear that our actions, and the perceptions involved in those actions, are largely habitual; learnt through imitation, and responsiveness within an environment and to a community. Indeed, without such a pre-reflective base, language-games would be unlearnable, and as Wittgenstein was also beginning to do at virtually the same historical moment (the early 1940's), Merleau-Ponty hence emphasizes the philosophical importance of the act of learning, and by implication, training. According to him, philosophy has generally been unable to adequately address these phenomena (PP 142), and it is worth repeating what I take to be an important sentence from the Phenomenology of Perception. Merleau-Ponty suggests that empiricism and intellectualism (the two logical outcomes of metaphysical thought), "are in agreement in that neither can grasp consciousness in the act of learning, and that neither attaches due importance to that circumscribed ignorance, that still empty but always determinate intention which is attention itself" (PP 28).

This emphasis upon consciousness in the act learning, is also what Dreyfus is intent on exploring in relation to Merleau-Ponty's philosophy, and he agrees that in the act of learning, consciousness is irremediably embodied. Dreyfus asks, "if everything is similar to everything else in an indefinitely large number of ways, what constrains the space of possible generalizations so that trial and error learning has a chance of succeeding? Here is where the body comes in". It is worth suggesting that this might apply equally if everything is dissimilar, other to everything else - the body narrows this disparate range of phenomena down, or more accurately, renders them intelligible. Our skilful embodiment makes it possible for us to encounter "more and more differentiated solicitations to act", and enables us to react to situations, in ways that have previously proved successful, and which do not require purposive thought.

However, in order to begin to fathom what Dreyfus' "embodied solicitations to act" might involve, it is worth contemplating the suggestion of another commentator, who also emphasizes the importance of the body in learning:

"Movements of the body are developed almost without conscious effort, in most cases. There seems to be a sort of intelligence of the body: a new dance is learned without analyzing the sequence of movements. Children learn dances very easily and well... This is also the reason why habits can be formed: the body seems to have understood and retained the new meaning" (Barral 137).

From this description, we can ascertain that it is usually not through conscious reflection and analysis that a dance or other language-game is learnt, but through repeated embodied efforts that are modified until the "right" movements are achieved. This intelligence of the body (for example, its capacity to innovate and retain new meaning), again denies the heavy emphasis that much of the philosophical tradition has placed upon interpretation, and certainly any conception of interpretation that contrasts itself with a purely passive perception. This can also be envisaged as applying just as well to the intellectual, as it does to the dancer. In reacting to their own different, but nevertheless distinct set of influences, they still choose modes of action in relation to past success. Even in the most apparently 'thoughtful' of activities, the body inclines itself towards an equilibrium.

It is worth making explicit that this habit to which we are referring, is far from being merely a mechanistic or behaviorist propensity to pursue a certain line of action. Our habitual mode of being is constantly being altered (in however small a way), and the point is that habit is far more akin to a competence, or a "flexible skill, a power of action and reaction" (Crossley 12), which can be mobilied under different conditions to achieve different effects (PP 143). However, we may want to ask, as Merleau-Ponty does, "if habituality is neither a form of knowledge nor an involuntary action, what is it then?" According to him, "it is knowledge in the hands, which is forthcoming only when bodily effort is made, and cannot be formulated in detachment from that effort" (PP 144). Merleau-Ponty suggests that this type of "knowledge in the hands" is primordial, and he implies that if we completely detach ourselves from this habitual base, we risk embarking upon philosophic and scientific endeavors that are of no practical benefit, and that might also artificially serve to legitimize the mind-body dualism.

Another good example of this practical and embodied intelligence that Merleau-Ponty insistently points us towards, is the driving of a car. We are intimately aware of how a particular car's gearshift needs to be treated, its ability to turn, accelerate, brake etc, and importantly, also of the dimensions of the vehicle. When we reflect on our own parking, it is remarkable that there are so few little bumps considering how many times we are actually forced to come very close. Indeed, even when reversing many drivers need not really monitor the progress of their car, because they 'know' (in the sense of a harmony between aim and intention) what result the various movements of the steering wheel are likely to induce. The car is absorbed into our body schema with almost the same precision that we have regarding our own spatiality. It becomes an "area of sensitivity" which extends "the scope and active radius of the touch" (PP 143) and rather than thinking about the car, it is more accurate to suggest that we think from the point of view of the car, and consequently also perceive our environment in a different way (Crossley 12). Notably, this thinking is not reflective or interpretive - we do not have to perceive the distance to a car park, and then reflect upon the fact that we are in a car of such and such proportions, before the delicate maneuver can be attempted. Rather, it is a practical mastery of a technique which ensures that the given rules can be followed blindly (or at least without reflective thought), and yet nevertheless with an embodied intelligence.

In one paragraph from the Phenomenology of Perception, Merleau-Ponty captures the issues at hand particularly well. He observes that:

"We said earlier that it is the body which "understands" in the acquisition of habituality. This way of putting it will appear absurd, if understanding is subsuming a sense datum under an idea, and if the body is an object. But the phenomenon of habituality is just what prompts us to revise our notion of "understand" and our notion of the body. To understand is to experience harmony between what we aim at and what is given, between the intention and the performance - and the body is our anchorage in the world" (PP 144).

In this paragraph, Merleau-Ponty defines understanding as a harmony between what we aim at and what is given, between intention and performance, and this also sheds some light upon his suggestion that consciousness is primarily not a matter of "I think that", but of "I can" (PP 137). Action in this paradigm is spontaneous and practical, and it is clear that we move phenomenally in a manner somewhat antithetical to the mind-body distinction (PP 145).

However, it is worth pointing out that while habit and the tendency to seek an equilibrium might help us adjust to the circumstances of our world, they don't simply make things easy. For Merleau-Ponty, "what enables us to centre our existence is also what prevents us from centering it completely, and the anonymity of our body is inseparably both freedom and servitude" (PP 85). Merleau-Ponty's point seems to be that though the body searches for equilibrium, as a mortal and temporal body it is also precluded from perpetual equilibrium (cf PP 346).

Merleau-Ponty's claim that knowing is far from an imperative for human action will be considered in greater detail throughout, but for the moment it is more important to consider some other consequences of his account of embodiment, particularly in relation to his suggestion that we move spontaneously, and pre-reflectively, in accord with our bodies. According to his version of the pre-reflective cogito, when one motions towards a friend to come nearer, there is no preceding or ancillary thought prepared within me which motivates my action (PP 111). I do not perceive a certain signal in my mind and then decide to act on it, or if I do, it is a rare and derivative occurrence. According to Merleau-Ponty, the immense difference posited by the philosophical tradition between thinking and perceiving (and of course, mind and body), is hence revealed as a mistake.

However, this suggestion that pre-reflective existence does not require interpretation, or any prior formulation of intention, is an important one and deserving of prolonged consideration. Insisting that we cannot discern an interior state that precedes the expression of that state, Merleau-Ponty suggests that "I am not in front of my body, I am in it or rather I am it... If we can still speak of interpretation in relation to the perception of one's own body, we shall have to say that it interprets itself" (PP 150). One would struggle to envisage a much closer relationship to the body than that, and Merleau-Ponty elsewhere goes so far as to suggest that:

"Nothing is changed when the subject is charged with interpreting his reactions himself, which is what is proper to introspection. When he is asked if he can read the letters inscribed on a panel or distinguish the details of a shape, he will not trust a vague "impression of legibility". He will attempt to read or describe what is presented to him" (SB 183).

According to Merleau-Ponty then, there is no 'mental' correlate of reading that makes it possible to definitively know that reading is taking place. Faced with the demand that they prove that they have actually read, an individual can only refer, with circularity, to the words that have read themselves, repeating what is in front of him or her. If further justification is demanded, eventually one can respond only by pointing out that "this is simply what I do", and that these are the practices that I engage in.

Refusing to accord the 'mental' any privileged status, Merleau-Ponty even suggests that:

"If I try to study love or hate purely from inner observation, I will find very little to describe: a few pangs, a few heart throbs - in short, trite agitations which do not reveal the essence of love or hate... We must reject the prejudice which makes "inner realities" out of love, hate or anger, leaving them accessible to one single witness: the person who feels them. Anger, shame, hate and love are not psychic facts hidden at the bottom of another's consciousness: they are types of behavior or styles of conduct which are visible from the outside" (SNS 52-3).

Human subjectivity is no longer conceived of as residing in an inaccessible, private domain of the 'mental'. Rather, Merleau-Ponty's notion of the body-subject entails an affirmation of public and surface interaction, and of the physiognomic qualities of our bodies. This does not preclude deep feelings, but merely suggests that they must necessarily be manifested in our public lives. A disturbance aroused in the affective life of an individual will have correlative repercussions in the physical, perceptive, and expressive life of that person. This will obviously have significant ramifications for how we conceive of relationships with the other, but these are not merely flippant remarks designed only to refute intellectualism and empiricism. Merleau-Ponty has thought through the consequences and recognizes, for example, that the Japanese express the emotion of love in significantly different ways to the archetypal French or Australian citizen. But for him this cultural variance, "or to be more precise, this difference of behavior, corresponds to a difference in the emotions themselves. It is not only the gesture that is contingent in relation to the body's organization, it is the manner itself in which we meet the situation and live it.... Feelings and passional conduct are invented like words" (PP 189).

This quote is slightly misleading, because Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of situation does not want to suggest that either passional conduct, or words for that matter, can simply be constructed from nothing by a self-actualized individual. The word invention, which seems to imply an individual inventing something, is the problematic term here. Both passional conduct and words however, are invented, but by a community, and hence subtend any individual existence.

b. Philosophy and Reflection

However, for some critics Merleau-Ponty's notion of the body-subject, and his emphasis upon the intentional arc that inclines one towards an equilibrium and tacitly suggests the derivative nature of thought and interpretation, induces a picture of humanity that is too easy, and not reflective enough. There is, after all, a tendency to interpret his position as being an advocacy of simple, spontaneous relations, and a nostalgic desire for some primordial inherence in Being. It has been suggested that Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology does not give the required amount of attention to reflection, and other factors that might complicate this spontaneous, pre-reflective state.

On the other hand, it might also be claimed that not only can Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of situation accommodate rationality, it also consigns it to its proper place. While in many ways his philosophy does affirm the primacy of perception (broadly construed to incorporate the practical action that it cannot be distinguished from), this doesn't simply come at the cost of sacrificing the validity of rational processes. Rather, it attempts to ground them in our situation, and to reinforce that reflection should not feign ignorance of its origins in perceptual experience. His point is simply that the "I can" precedes and conditions the possibility of the "I know" (PP 137). As Merleau-Ponty states, there is "a privilege of reason, but precisely in order to understand it properly, we must begin by replacing thought amongst the phenomena of perception" (PrP 222).

Analytic thought, and philosophy per se, can and should be used to render pre-reflective experience intelligible, for as he points out:

"It is a question not of putting the perceptual faith in place of reflection, but on the contrary of taking into account the total situation, which involves reference from the one to the other. What is given is not a massive and opaque world, or a universe of adequate thought; it is a reflection which turns back over the density of the world in order to clarify it, but which, coming second, reflects back to it only its own light" (VI 35).

Indeed, despite the nostalgic yearning that Merleau-Ponty occasionally seems to have for a primordial union with the world, he nevertheless makes it clear that one never returns to immediate experience. It is only a question of whether we are to try to understand it, and he believes that to attempt to express immediate experience is not to betray reason but, on the contrary, to work towards its aggrandizement. Philosophy is hence a means to improve our ways of living, and reason has a role in this, providing that it is based in the phenomenological exigencies of the subject and their life-world. While his philosophy is poised on the margins of philosophy and non-philosophy, it is not anti-philosophical in any respect.

c. Ambiguity

Moreover, Merleau-Ponty does not intend to suggest that the complicity of body and mind that we see in habit and the mastery of a certain technique, implies an absolute awareness of one's own 'subjectivity'. According to him, "there is the absolute certitude of the world in general, but not of anything in particular" (PP 344). Knowing an individual person in a particular manifestation may presuppose an understanding of humanity in its totality, but certainly not any singular motivation for a particular act. Lived relations can never be grasped perfectly by consciousness, since the body-subject is never entirely present-to-itself. Meaningful behavior is lived through, rather than thematized and reflected upon, and this ensures that the actions of particular individuals "may be meaningful without them being fully or reflectively aware of the meaning that their action creates or embodies. In this sense, the behaving actor is not a fully-fledged subject in the Cartesian sense. She is not fully transparent to herself" (Crossley 12). There is ambiguity then, precisely because we are not capable of disembodied reflection upon our activities, but are involved in an intentional arc that absorbs both our body and our mind (PP 136). For Merleau-Ponty, both intellectualism and empiricism presuppose "a universe perfectly explicit in itself" (PP 41), but residing between these two positions, his body-subject actually requires ambiguity and, in a sense, indeterminacy.

According to Merleau-Ponty, ambiguity prevails both in my perception of things, and in the knowledge I have of myself, primarily because of our temporal situation which he insists cannot but be ambiguous. He suggests that:

"My hold on the past and the future is precarious and my possession of my own time is always postponed until a stage when I may fully understand it, yet this stage can never be reached, since it would be one more moment bounded by the horizon of its future, and requiring in its turn, further developments in order to be understood" (PP 346 cf 426).

In such sentiments Merleau-Ponty seems to be suggesting that the relationship that we have to ourselves is one that is always typified by alterity, on account of a temporal explosion towards the future that precludes us ever being self-present. [The term "alterity" is basically synonymous with otherness and radical difference, but it also emphasizes change and transformation in a way that these terms might not.]  There can be no self-enclosed "now" moment because time also always has this reflexive aspect that is aware of itself, and that opens us to experiences beyond our particular horizons of significance. Indeed, it is because of this temporal alterity, that Merleau-Ponty asserts that we can never say 'I' absolutely (PP 208). Rather, he suggests, "I know myself only insofar as I am inherent in time and in the world, that is, I know myself only in my ambiguity" (PP 345). Elsewhere in the Phenomenology of Perception he goes on to imply that the subject is time and time is the subject (PP 431-2), and these sentiments are not that far from certain 'postmodern' conceptions of subjectivity.

Moreover, the attempt to take seriously the notion of ambiguity would, or at least should, also involve the deconstruction of what is termed the 'metaphysics of presence'. Being the "mark of a thought which is resolutely attempting to overcome oppositional thinking itself" (MPHP 120), Merleau-Ponty's emphasis upon ambiguity, if consistently adhered to, would seem capable of refuting the various readings of him that assert that he is overly preoccupied with presence.

Mary Barral puts Merleau-Ponty's point exceedingly well, when she suggests that "since we cannot remain in the alternative of either not understanding the subject, or of knowing nothing about the object, we must seek the object at the very heart of our experience... to understand the paradox that there is a "for-us" of the "in-itself" (Barral 130 cf PP 71). In other words, we must attain an understanding of what Merleau-Ponty describes elsewhere as "the paradox of transcendence in immanence" (PrP 16) - that is, to understand that objects are given over to us, influenced by us, just as we are influenced by the objects that surround us. For Merleau-Ponty, this interdependence and mutual encroachment is evident in all aspects of perception and subjectivity. As he makes clear, "whenever I try to understand myself, the whole fabric of the perceptible world comes too, and with it comes the others who are caught in it (S 15). In the concluding words of the Phenomenology of Perception he insists that "man is a network of relations" (PP 456), or "man is a knot of relations", depending upon the translation, and the strong implication of Merleau-Ponty's philosophy is that this is not a knot (or network) of the Gordian variety, and that these relations are not something that we can, or even should, want to unravel. The interdependence of the knot is what gives humanity its very qualities, and by dissecting it, we risk losing the very thing that establishes us as human.

But I think this point is best explored by Merleau-Ponty when he describes how in writing his philosophical texts, he might not necessarily have a precise idea of exactly where his discussion is leading but, "as if by magic", the words flow from him and slowly become a cogent whole (PP 177). This is not to be dismissed as merely being symptomatic of a supposed continental lack of philosophical rigor. All papers, analytic or otherwise, are not written in the head, entirely worked out, before they are laid down. The process of laying them down inevitably effects alterations. Merleau-Ponty embraces this aspect of writing, and he doesn't consider it merely the derivative attempt to faithfully transcribe some self-present thought. However, there is also the further point that where exactly the written creation derives from (the particular word, as much as the whole book) is a fundamentally ambiguous point, since it is neither the self-present subject, nor the cultural world, which determines the product, but the knot, the sum relation of all networks.

Again, this also necessitates a certain ambiguity at the heart of our experience. Trying to discern what is a legitimate authentic project of the self, which is not induced by the demands of one's society, is infinitely difficult. Indeed, it is not a possibility for Merleau-Ponty and because of its overtones of an unattainable individualism, he refused to use the existential concept of authenticity for his entire career. But he would not want to say that something like, but slightly different from authenticity (that is, an individual coming to terms with their own situation in an empowering way), is an impossibility. In many ways, this is a primary ethical demand of his. Finally however, this ambiguity at the heart of our experience will always be there and an authentic path is not one that we consciously choose by attempting to ensure that we are the only origin of our projects, somehow attempting what he contends is impossible; that is, the transcending of our environment. Rather, Merleau-Ponty's suggestion is that circumstances point us to, and in fact, allow us to find a way (PP 456). The human situation is both a product of the 'mind' and our socio-historical situation, and moral achievement is a tenuous embrace of these facts.

3. Later Philosophy

Merleau-Ponty died before he had the opportunity to complete The Visible and the Invisible, which was intended to be a text of some considerable proportions. He left us with three reasonably complete chapters, as well as his "Working Notes" for the remainder of this book, and from these two sources it is apparent that his thought had undergone some transformations. However, opinions vary widely as to the extent of these changes. Indeed, it is worth recalling that in an essay that was unpublished in his own lifetime, Merleau-Ponty describes his philosophical career as falling into two distinct phases: he tells us that the first phase of his work - up to and including the Phenomenology of Perception - involved an attempt to restore the world of perception and to affirm the primacy of the pre-reflective cogito. In other words, in this period of his work he was intent on emphasizing an inherence in the world that is more fundamental than our thinking/reflective capacities. The second distinct phase of his work, which refers predominantly to The Visible and the Invisible as well as to the abandoned Prose of the World, is characterized as an attempt "to show how communication with others, and thought, take up and go beyond the realm of perception" (EW 367-8). This is important for several reasons, not least that it suggests a fairly major change in direction. The idea that communication with others goes beyond the realm of perception, is sufficiently radical to put him at odds with at least a certain definition of phenomenology.

Ostensibly in opposition to this type of characterisation, Martin Dillon's book Merleau-Ponty's Ontology has emphasized that these two periods of Merleau-Ponty's career are actually intimately connected. Dillon downplays the significance of quotes from Merleau-Ponty like that which has just been cited, and instead insists that The Visible and the Invisible is primarily concerned with bringing the results of the earlier work, which are often primarily psychological, to their ontological explication. Merleau-Ponty has also suggested similar things at times (cf VI 176), and according to this type of account, the ontology of his later philosophy was already implied in his earlier works.

Despite agreeing with the broad outlines of this position, there are nevertheless some problems with such a characterization that suggest that the truth of this dispute might lie somewhere between these respective accounts. The more radical aspects of The Visible and the Invisible are ignored by the view that conflates these two major periods, and Merleau-Ponty's treatment of Sartre's work in his two main texts (VI and PP) also seems to be importantly different. It is however, more for exegetical than philosophical reasons that I have separated out Merleau-Ponty's thought into two major periods.

a. The Critique of the Phenomenology of Perception

Before we begin to examine his final attempt to circumvent the subject-object dichotomy, it is first necessary to get some idea as to why Merleau-Ponty thought his philosophy had to change. Basically his main criticism of the Phenomenology of Perception is that it remains confined within a philosophy of consciousness, or a philosophy of mind paradigm. He thinks that to a certain extent the Phenomenology of Perception remains Cartesian, in that it starts from the position of the reflecting philosopher in his or her ivory tower. Merleau-Ponty suggests that this starting point presupposes a subject doing the reflection, and it hence has an element of humanism about it.

More importantly however, he suggests that this starting point also means that the problems he raises are largely insoluble, as he never quite gets away from a subject/object dichotomy. If it is unclear what all of these references to a subject-object dichotomy mean, I am simply pointing out the tendency in Western philosophy to posit that which is seen within the field of vision as an object, whereas that which looks, or does the perceiving, is the subject. Various versions of this type of thought have recurred throughout the tradition, and this partly explains the tendency that we have to think in terms of things in the world (for example, empirical objects or facts), and the human capacity to reflect upon these brute things of the world, and hence transcend them. We generally maintain a very distinct difference between ourselves and the objects of the world - say the seat upon which we sit - and it might be suggested that we are free, and they are determined, for instance. Or even if one does not want to assert that human activity is predominantly reflective (and usually this amounts to saying that it is free), philosophers and most of us generally, think in terms of the difference between the empirical fact of what we did, and our reason which transcends this behavior. This object/consciousness distinction is a dualism.

In The Visible and the Invisible, Merleau-Ponty suggests that the Phenomenology of Perception was ultimately unsuccessful in getting beyond this dualistic way of thinking. Of course, there is little doubt that Merleau-Ponty is a little bit harsh in regards to his retrospective accounts of his earlier philosophy, and is also simplifying matters if he wants us to believe that the Phenomenology of Perception doesn't significantly problematize this subject-object dichotomy, and any of philosophies other traditional dualisms.

What is clear however, is that The Visible and the Invisible does attempt to effect a transition from something like a phenomenology of consciousness (which is basically just an analysis of how the objects we perceive present themselves to us), to a philosophy of Being. Being is another of those words in philosophy that is frequently thrown around, but perhaps relatively rarely understood. This is partly because it is not something that we can pin down or define, because it exceeds all of our resources for attempting to describe it. Let us suggest, hesitatingly, that Being is that which allows existence to be possible at all, and Merleau-Ponty becomes increasingly concerned with such matters.

This move away from a subject-based philosophy also has some important consequences for the type of philosophy that he was interested in writing. No longer is his work so strictly an analysis of phenomenological subjectivity, and this means that in some ways The Visible and the Invisible is a little harder to get into than his earlier work. It is not existential in the sense that the Phenomenology of Perception is. This earlier text is typified by numerous phenomenological descriptions of our everyday activity and the situations that confront us, and his later work is more concerned with ontological matters.

Ontology just means the study of Being, of that which allows things to be at all, and it is this type of terrain that Merleau-Ponty moves into. One could even suggest that The Visible and the Invisible gives the results of the Phenomenology of Perception their ontological significance. In that sense, the subject influenced, and often psychological thinking of his earlier work, would be revealed as also presupposing an account of the structure of Being, which only later came to be elaborated. It is apparent however, that his thought his changed to the extent that the notion of subjectivity, and its controlling place, is further diminished. References to the body-subject are also conspicuously absent in his later philosophy, and he seems to have decided that such terminology is inadequate. The consequences of this move away from a subjective orientation will become more apparent when we consider his ontology later in this essay.

Merleau-Ponty also makes one other important comment about the Phenomenology of Perception, and his reasons for writing a new ontology, which is worth exploring. According to him, a major factor behind him setting out upon this different path, was the conviction that the tacit or pre-reflective cogito of his earlier philosophy is problematic (VI 179). The pre-reflective cogito is basically just the idea that there is a cogito before language, or to put it crudely, that there is a self anterior to both language and thought that we can aim to get in closer contact with. The notion of a pre-reflective cogito hence presumes the possibility of a consciousness without language, and it exhibits something of a nostalgic desire to return to some brute, primordial experience. This is something that thinkers like Irigiray have criticized Merleau-Ponty for, and in The Visible and the Invisible he has come to share these type of concerns.

In his own words, he suggests that while this concept of the pre-reflective, or tacit cogito, can make understood how language is not impossible, it nevertheless cannot make understood how it is possible (VI 179). While a logician might grimace at such a suggestion, Merleau-Ponty is certainly aware of this paradox, and seeks to explicate the problems that he associates with this concept of the tacit cogito. He suggests that like all other philosophies of consciousness, his notion of the pre-reflective cogito depends upon the illusion of non-linguistic signification and The Visible and The Invisible attempts to call into question the very coherence of such a concept. As he states in one of his "Working Notes":

"What I call the tacit cogito is impossible. To have the idea of thinking (in the sense of thought of seeing and thought of feeling), to make the phenomenological reduction to the things themselves, to return to immanence and to consciousness, it is necessary to have words. It is by the combination of words that I form the transcendental attitude" (VI 171).

He later goes on to speak of the "mythology of self-consciousness to which the word consciousness refers", and contends that "there are only differences between significations" and language (VI 171).

According to Merleau-Ponty, the tacit cogito is therefore a product of language, and the language of the philosopher, in particular. He continues to speak of a world of silence, but the concept of the pre-reflective cogito imports the language of the philosophy of consciousness into the equation, and hence misrepresents the relationship between vision and speech. The famous phenomenological reduction to the things themselves, which tries to bracket out the outside world, is hence envisaged as a misplaced nostalgia rather than as a real possibility.

There is a sense in which Merleau-Ponty's giving up on the pre-reflective cogito also entails something like a giving up on phenomenology, despite the fact that embodiment is still a major factor in The Visible and the Invisible. By way of clarification, it is worth noting that he still thinks that an analysis of the body is one of the best ways to avoid the subject-object dichotomy that he argues is typical of most philosophical thought. At the same time however, his abandonment of the idea of a pre-reflective cogito, or consciousness before linguistic significance, at the very least serves to radicalize phenomenology. It also means that language comes to play a far more important role in his philosophy than it previously had.

Indeed, Merleau-Ponty used both linguistics, and the language-based emphasis of structuralism to critique Sartre, among other of his contemporaries, who only accorded language a minimal role in their philosophies. He was also friends with, and used the work of people like Jacques Lacan (a psychoanalyst who suggested that the unconscious is structured like a language), Claude Levi-Strauss (a structuralist anthropologist who dedicated his major work The Savage Mind to the memory of Merleau-Ponty), and also Ferdinand De Saussure (a linguist who showed what a pivotal role differences play in language, and whose work has inspired many recent philosophers including Derrida). Merleau-Ponty was hence very much involved in what is termed the linguistic turn, and one curious aspect of Merleau-Ponty's place within the philosophical tradition is that despite the enduring attention he accords to the problem of language, the work of thinkers such as those cited above, and others who have been inspired by them (Derrida and Foucault for example), has been used to criticize him. In an important way, he paradoxically laid the groundwork for his own denigration and unfashionability in French intellectual circles, and it is only in the last 15 years that it has been realized that his phenomenology took very seriously the claims of such thinkers, and even pre-empted some aspects of what has come to be termed 'postmodern' thought. Levi-Strauss actually finds The Visible and the Invisible to be a synthesis of structuralism with phenomenology, and he is not alone in this regard.

b. The Chiasm/Reversibility

Rather than maintaining a traditional dualism in which mind and body, subject and object, self and other, and so forth, are discrete and separate entities, in The Visible and the Invisible Merleau-Ponty argues that there is an important sense in which such pairs are also associated. For example, he does not dispute that there is a divergence, or dehiscence, in our embodied situation that is evident in the difference that exists between touching and being touched, between looking and being looked at, or between the sentient and the sensible in his own vocabulary. On the contrary, this divergence is considered to be a necessary and constitutive factor in allowing subjectivity to be possible at all. However, he suggests that rather than involving a simple dualism, this divergence between touching and being touched, or between the sentient and the sensible, also allows for the possibility of overlapping and encroachment between these two terms.

For example, Merleau-Ponty has somewhat famously suggested that the experience of touching cannot be understood without reference to the tacit potential for this situation to be reversed. As Thomas Busch points out, The Visible and the Invisible highlights that "in the body's touching of itself is found a differentiation and an encroachment which is neither sheer identity nor non-identity" (MPHP 110). To substantiate this claim in adequate detail would take us too far afield of this essay's main concerns, but it is important to recognize that Merleau-Ponty's initial, and I think permissible presumption, is that we can never simultaneously touch our right hand while it is also touching an object of the world. He suggests that "either my right hand really passes over into the rank of the touched, but then its hold on the world is interrupted, or it retains its hold on the world, but then I do not really touch it" (VI 148). There is then, a gap (or ecart in French) between ourselves as touching and ourselves as touched, a divergence between the sentient and sensible aspects of our existence, but this gap is importantly distinct from merely reinstating yet another dualism. Touching and touched are not simply separate orders of being in the world, since they are reversible, and this image of our left hand touching our right hand does more than merely represent the body's capacity to be both perceiving object and subject of perception in a constant oscillation (as is arguably the case in Sartre's looked at, looked upon, dichotomy, as well as the master-slave oscillations that such a conception induces). As Merleau-Ponty suggests:

"I can identify the hand touched in the same one which will in a moment be touching... In this bundle of bones and muscles which my right hand presents to my left, I can anticipate for an instant the incarnation of that other right hand, alive and mobile, which I thrust towards things in order to explore them. The body tries... to touch itself while being touched and initiates a kind of reversible reflection" (PP 93).

This suggests that the hand that we touch, while it is touching an inanimate object, is hence not merely another such 'object', but another fleshy substance that is capable of reversing the present situation and being mobile and even aggressive. Given that we cannot touch ourselves, or even somebody else, without this recognition of our own tangibility and capacity to be touched by others, it seems that the awareness of what it feels like to be touched encroaches, or even supervenes upon the experience of touching (VI 147). Any absolute distinction between being in the world as touching, and being in the world as touched, deprives the existential phenomena of their true complexity. Our embodied subjectivity is never located purely in either our tangibility or in our touching, but in the intertwining of these two aspects, or where the two lines of a chiasm intersect with one another. The chiasm then, is simply an image to describe how this overlapping and encroachment can take place between a pair that nevertheless retains a divergence, in that touching and touched are obviously never exactly the same thing.

According to Merleau-Ponty, these observations also retain an applicability that extends well beyond the relationship that obtains between touching and being touched. He contends that mind and body (VI 247, 259), the perceptual faith and its articulation (VI 93), subject and object, self and world (VI 123), as well as many other related dualisms, are all associated chiasmically, and he terms this interdependence of these various different notions the flesh (VI 248-51). The rather radical consequences of this intertwining become most obvious when Merleau-Ponty sets about describing the interactions of this embodied flesh. At one stage in The Visible and the Invisible he suggests that the realization that the world is not simply an object:

"does not mean that there was a fusion or coinciding of me with it: on the contrary, this occurs because a sort of dehiscence opens my body in two, and because between my body looked at and my body looking, my body touched and my body touching, there is overlapping or encroachment, so that we may say that the things pass into us, as well as we into the things" (VI 123).

According to Merleau-Ponty then, this non-dualistic divergence between touching and being touched, which necessitates some form of encroachment between the two terms, also means that the world is capable of encroaching upon and altering us, just as we are capable of altering it. Such an ontology rejects any absolute antinomy between self and world, as well as any notion of subjectivity that prioritizes a rational, autonomous individual, who is capable of imposing their choice upon a situation that is entirely external to them. To put the problem in Sartrean terms, while it may sometimes prove efficacious to distinguish between transcendence and facticity [a technical term of Martin Heidegger's that in Merleau-Ponty's usage refers to the sum of brute "facts" about us, including our social situation and our physical attributes, abilities and circumstances], or Being-for-itself and Being-in-itself, Merleau-Ponty thinks that such notions also overlap in such a way as to undermine any absolute difference between these two terms. As a consequence, Sartre's conception of an absolute freedom in regards to a situation is also rendered untenable by the recognition of the ways in which self and world are chiasmically intertwined, though this is not to suggest that the world can be reduced to us. Indeed, Merleau-Ponty explicitly asserts that precisely what is rarely considered is this paradoxical fact that though we are of the world, we are nevertheless not the world (VI 127), and in affirming the interdependence of humanity and the 'things' of the world in a way that permits neither fusion nor absolute distance, he advocates an embodied inherence of a different type.

c. The Other

Given that he rarely makes any distinction between the structure of our relations with others and the structure of our relations with the world, his descriptions also pertain directly to the problem of the other, which has come to be accorded of lot of attention in recent times under the auspices of what is frequently termed alterity. Merleau-Ponty's chiasmic ontology ensures that in some sense the other is always already intertwined within the subject, and he explicitly suggests that self and non-self are but the obverse and reverse of each other (VI 83, 160). If I can present his position a little schematically, basically his later philosophy attempts to reinforce that self and other are also relationally constituted via their potential reversibility. One example of this might be the way in which looking at another person - or even a painter looking at trees, according to one of Merleau-Ponty's more enigmatic examples - always also involves the tacit recognition that we too can be looked at. However, rather than simply oscillating between these two modes of being - looker and looked upon, as Sartrean philosophy would have it - for Merleau-Ponty each experience is betrothed to the other in such a way that we are never simply a disembodied looker, or a transcendental consciousness. Rather, the alterity of the other's look is always already involved in us, and rather than unduly exalting alterity by positing it as forever elusive, or as recognizable only as freedom that transcends my freedom, he instead affirms an interdependence of self and other that involves these categories overlapping and intertwining with one another, but without ever being reduced to each other. One consequence of Merleau-Ponty's position is that questions regarding the otherness of the other are rendered something of an abstraction, at least if they attempt to conceive of that other without reference to the subjectivity with which it is always chiasmically intertwined. As Dorothy Olkowski has suggested, "if there is to be room in the world for others as others, there must be some connection between self and other that exceeds purely psychic life" (Olkowski 4), and this is envisaged as an ontological necessity rather than an attempt to propound a thesis that restores us to the primordial affection that we have for the other. For Merleau-Ponty, a responsible treatment of alterity consists in recognizing that alterity is always already intertwined within subjectivity, rather than by obscuring this fact by projecting a self-present individual who is confronted by an alterity that is essentially inaccessible and beyond comprehension. Far from merely being a negative thing, the alterity of the other is too complicated to simply be posited as that which will forever elude us, and such a description ignores the important ways in which self and other are partially intertwined.

In The Visible and the Invisible then, there is a tacit claim regarding what a responsible treatment of the alterity of the other consists in, even if Merleau-Ponty rarely considers notions like responsibility in any explicit fashion. His final ontology wants to insist that alterity is something that can only be appreciated in being encountered, and in a recognition of the fact that there can be no absolute alterity. If absolute alterity is but a synonym of death, and inconceivable to humanity, then what needs to be considered, according to Merleau-Ponty, is the paradoxical way in which self and other are intertwined, and yet also, and at the same time, divergent.

Indeed, Merleau-Ponty is also careful not to fall prey to what has been termed, sometimes disparagingly, the horizonality of phenomenology. He devotes an entire chapter titled "Interrogation and Intuition" to distancing himself from this tendency of phenomenology - which he traces to Hegel, Husserl and Bergson - to subsume all else under the concept of context and background. Engendering a coincidence between self and world (or self and other), is just as antithetical to his philosophical purposes as advocating a vast abyssal difference, and Merleau-Ponty asserts that when we are overly sure of the other, just as when we are overly unsure of the other, an inadequate apprehension of human relations beckons. For Merleau-Ponty, alterity is that which cannot be reduced to the logic of an either/or, as he doesn't want to espouse a Sartrean version of human relations where the other can never really be understood, and yet nor does his philosophy reductively ignore this alterity. He suggests that: "this infinite distance, this absolute proximity express in two ways - as a soaring over or as fusion - the same relationship with the thing itself. They are two positivisms..." (VI 127), indeed, neither of which he wants to associate with his new ontology.

In an attempt to avoid this dualistic tendency to conceive of the other as either beyond the comprehension of a subject, or as domesticated by the subject and their horizons of significance, The Visible and the Invisible emphasizes that the other is always already encroaching upon us, though they are not reducible to us, and for Merleau-Ponty, the risk of this overlapping with the other can and should always be there (VI 123). His philosophy consistently alludes to the manner in which this encroachment is not simply a bad thing. For Merleau-Ponty, interacting with and influencing the other (even contributing to permanently changing them), does not necessarily constitute a denial of their alterity. On the contrary, if done properly it in fact attests to it, because we are open to the possibility of being influenced and changed by the difference that they bring to bear upon our interaction with them. This is the ethics that his ontology of the flesh tacitly presupposes, and it is a position that is importantly different from those proposed by more recent philosophers, including Sartre, Levinas and Derrida respectively.

d. Hyper-Reflection

Before themes like the death of philosophy, and the non-space of philosophy began to dominate the philosophical landscape, Merleau-Ponty had already begun to articulate a similar problem, though arguably without sharing quite the same nihilistic consequences that some more recent proponents of a similar position have found themselves implicated in. Harboring a deep distrust of the philosophy of reflection, Merleau-Ponty sought to ensure that reflection was not unduly exalted in the Phenomenology of Perception, and The Visible and the Invisible reaffirms this contention, albeit in slightly different terms, through his espoused methodology of "hyper-reflection," which is also synonymously referred to as a "hyper-dialectic." There are several aspects of this notion that require delineation, but the most obvious of these pertains to the role of philosophy, and precisely what he thinks it can accomplish.

At one stage in The Visible and the Invisible, Merleau-Ponty rather controversially claims that in the philosopher's descriptions of the sensible world, "there is no longer identity between the lived experience and the principle of non-contradiction" (VI 87). Merleau-Ponty's apparent disavowal of the law of non-contradiction requires further consideration, as it challenges one of the most fundamental principles of Western philosophy since Aristotle. In explaining his rejection of this principle, he suggests that:

"The situation of the philosopher who speaks as distinct from what he speaks of, insofar as that situation affects what he says with a certain latent content which is not its manifest content... implies a divergence between the essences he fixes and the lived experience to which they are applied, between the operation of living the world and the entities and negentities in which he expresses it" (VI 87).

For Merleau-Ponty then, lived experience may partake in contradiction on account of a residue of this difference between the act of speaking and what is spoken of, as well as a correlative divergence between a latent content and a manifest content. This divergence that he theorizes hints at a predicament that seems closely related to what Jacques Derrida has more recently insisted upon in his strategy of deconstruction, in that both philosophers point towards the inevitability of a philosophical expression containing contrary elements within it. While Derrida has also implicitly entertained the possibility that the law of non-contradiction might be false, in suggesting that their may instead be a law of impurity or "a principle of contamination", it is important to ascertain that their are some surprising similarities between Merleau-Ponty and Derrida's descriptions of the necessarily double nature of a philosophy that can never recapture the pre-reflective faith, or coincide with itself in a moment of self-presence. This strange proximity between deconstruction and Merleau-Ponty's own methodology cannot be explored in any detail in this essay, but Jean-Francois Lyotard and Rodolphe Gasche are two important 'continental' thinkers to have recognized the manner in which Merleau-Ponty's notion of a hyper-reflection pre-empted aspects of deconstruction.

Of course, unlike Derrida, Merleau-Ponty's critique of reflection, and his subsequent call for a hyper-reflection, quite obviously locates itself primarily in an analysis of the body where he discerns a necessary and constitutive divergence within the embodied situation. As we have seen, this ecart is variously described as the difference between the sentient and the sensible, the tangible and the touched, and for Merleau-Ponty, it also applies to several other divergences, including one between the perceptual faith and its articulation (VI 87). Once again, this concept is most easily demonstrated through an example that we have previously contemplated - that is, an individual's left hand touching their right hand, while their right hand is also simultaneously touching another object. Of this situation, Merleau-Ponty suggests that:

"If my left hand is touching my right hand, and if I wish to suddenly apprehend with my right hand the work of my left hand as it touches, this reflection of the body upon itself always miscarries at the last moment: the moment I feel my left hand with my right hand, I correspondingly cease touching my right hand with my left hand" (VI 9, cf to PP 108).

According to Merleau-Ponty, there is hence a fundamental divergence within the body, but just as this gap ensures the impossibility of any thorough and all-encompassing self-perception, it is also that which allows perception, and indeed subjectivity, to be possible at all. It is important to ascertain that if our embodied divergence inaugurates our capacity for perception (as well as language and reflection), this same divergence also ensures that there are certain limits upon this capacity. Just as we cannot reflexively attain to a self-identity with the hand that we are touching, for Merleau-Ponty the philosophy of reflection cannot entirely overcome similar divergences (VI 38).

In his critique of Hegel, Sartre and others, Merleau-Ponty insists that "reflection recuperates everything except itself as an effort of recuperation, it clarifies everything except its own role" (VI 33). There is a temporal divergence that precludes the attempted recovery of meaning via reflection from coinciding with that which it attempts to demarcate. The task of hyper-reflection then, is to ensure that reflection is always aware of its own finitude. It is hence somewhat removed from philosophical reflection itself, and resides in what several theorists have referred to as the non-space of philosophy. The proximity of such sentiments to Derrida has been widely recognized (and also occasionally contested), but what is irrefutable is that Merleau-Ponty is concerned with the tendency of the metaphysical tradition to exalt self-presence, as well as the rationalism that this usually entails. While traditional reflective thought is inevitable and indeed indispensable, the idea of philosophy being able to mirror or transcend nature is disparaged (VI 99). Philosophy and other reflective pursuits cannot recuperate the pre-reflective faith or rediscover some pure immediacy (VI 35, 99). On the contrary, he claims that:

"What we propose here, and oppose to the search for the essence, is not the return to the immediate, the coincidence, the effective fusion with the existent, the search for an original integrity, for a secret lost and to be rediscovered, which would nullify our questions and even reprehend language. If coincidence is lost, this is no accident; if Being is hidden, this is itself a characteristic of Being and no disclosure will make us comprehend it" (VI 121-2).

Of course, this is a rather negative characterization of what hyper-reflection involves, and it is worth digressing to consider more precisely what it is that Merleau-Ponty wants his philosophy to achieve. According to him:

"What we call hyper-dialectic is a thought that, on the contrary, is capable of reaching truth because it envisages without restriction the plurality of the relationships and what has been called ambiguity. The bad dialectic is that which thinks it recomposes being by a thetic thought, by an assemblage of statements, by thesis, antithesis, and synthesis; the good dialectic is that which is conscious of the fact that every thesis is an idealization, that Being is not made up of idealizations or of things said... but of bound wholes where signification never is except in tendency" (VI 94).

While this passage reaffirms the enduring role of ambiguity in his philosophy, Merleau-Ponty's hyper-dialectic is also described as acknowledging that not only is every thesis an idealisation, but that Being cannot be ascertained through such idealisations. He also goes on to suggest that such a dialectical thought:

"Abounds in the sensible world, but on condition that the sensible world has been divested of all that the ontologies have added to it. One of the tasks of the dialectic, as a situational thought, a thought in contact with being, is to shake off the false evidences, to denounce the significations cut off from the experience of being, emptied - and to criticize itself in the measure that it itself becomes one of them" (VI 92).

Merleau-Ponty's hyper-dialectic is envisaged as being a situational thought that must criticize all thinking that ignores the conditional nature of idealizations, and it must also maintain a vigilance to ensure that it does not itself become one of them. This is why Merleau-Ponty describes his project as propounding an 'indirect' ontology, rather than a direct ontology (VI 179). Undoubtedly these themes are deserving of more prolonged attention, but there seems to be a significant and underestimated connection between what Merleau-Ponty's hyper-reflection seeks to achieve, and what Derrida's deconstructive methodology has more recently attempted. Without digressing unduly in this regard, his work retains a relevance to contemporary European philosophy, and not least because many theorists are convinced that he is a valuable resource who doesn't quite succumb to the excesses of his successors on the French scene.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Writings

  • Adventures of the Dialectic, trans. Bien, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
  • The Essential Writings of Merleau-Ponty, ed. Fisher, New York: Harcourt, 1969 (referred to as EW in main text).
  • Humanism and Terror: An Essay on the Communist Problem, trans. O'Neill, Boston: Beacon Press, 1969.
  • Phenomenology of Perception, trans. Smith, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1962 (PP in text).
  • The Primacy of Perception: and Other Essays on Phenomenology, Psychology, the Philosophy of Art, History and Politics, ed. Edie, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1964 (PrP in text).
  • Prose of the World, trans. O'Neill, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1969.
  • Sense and Nonsense, trans. Dreyfus & Dreyfus, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1964 (SNS in text).
  • Signs, trans. McCleary, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1964 (S in text).
  • The Structure of Behavior, trans. Fischer, London: Metheun, 1965 (SB in text).
  • The Visible and the Invisible, trans. Lingis, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1968 (VI in text).

b. Some Commentaries and Collections of Essays

  • Barral, M., Merleau-Ponty: The Role of the Body-Subject in Interpersonal Relations, Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1965 (Barral in text).
  • Busch, T., and Gallagher, S., (eds) Merleau-Ponty, Hermeneutics and Postmodernism, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992 (MPHP in text).
  • Crossley, N., The Politics of Subjectivity: Between Foucault and Merleau-Ponty, Aldershot, England: Brookfield USA, Avebury Series in Philosophy, 1994 (Crossley in text).
  • Dillon, M., Merleau-Ponty's Ontology, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1988.
  • Dillon, M., (ed) Ecart and Differance: Merleau-Ponty and Derrida on Seeing and Writing, New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1997.
  • Evans, F and Lawlor, L., (eds) Chiasms: Merleau-Ponty's Notion of Flesh, Albany: State University of New York Press, Suny Series in Contemporary Continental Philosophy, 2000.
  • Langer, M., Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception, Hampshire: MacMillan Press, 1989.
  • Madison, G., The Phenomenology of Merleau-Ponty: A Search for the Limits of Consciousness, Athens: Ohio University Press, 1981.
  • Olkowski, D., and Morley, J., (eds) Merleau-Ponty, Interiority and Exteriority, Psychic Life and the World, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1999 (Olkowski in text).
  • Priest, S., Merleau-Ponty, London: Routledge, 1998.
  • Schmidt, J., Maurice Merleau-Ponty: Between Phenomenology and Structuralism, New York: St Martin's Press, 1985.

Author Information

Jack Reynolds
La Trobe University

Jacques Lacan (1901-1981)

Portrait de Jacques LacanIt would be fair to say that there are few twentieth century thinkers who have had such a far-reaching influence on subsequent intellectual life in the humanities as Jacques Lacan. Lacan's "return to the meaning of Freud" profoundly changed the institutional face of the psychoanalytic movement internationally. His seminars in the 1950s were one of the formative environments of the currency of philosophical ideas that dominated French letters in the 1960s and'70s, and which has come to be known in the Anglophone world as "post-structuralism."

Both inside and outside of France, Lacan's work has also been profoundly important in the fields of aesthetics, literary criticism and film theory. Through the work of Louis Pierre Althusser (and more lately Ernesto Laclau, Jannis Stavrokakis and Slavoj Zizek), Lacanian theory has also left its mark on political theory, and particularly the analysis of ideology and institutional reproduction.

This article seeks to outline something of the philosophical heritage and importance of Lacan's theoretical work. After introducing Lacan, it focuses primarily on Lacan's philosophical anthropology, philosophy of language, psychoanalysis and philosophy of ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical and General Introduction
    1. Biography
    2. Intellectual Biography
    3. Theoretical Project
  2. Lacan's Philosophical Anthropology
    1. The Mirror Stage
    2. Desire is the Desire of the Other
    3. Oedipal Complex, Castration, Name of the Father, and the Big Other
    4. The Law and Symbolic Identification
    5. Summary
    6. Lacan's Diagnostic Categories
  3. Lacan's Philosophy of Language
    1. Language and Law
    2. Psychoanalysis as Interpretation
    3. The Curative Efficacy of the "Talking Cure"
  4. Lacanian Psychoanalysis and Philosophy of Ethics
    1. Master Signifiers, and the Decentred Nature of Belief
    2. Lacan's Conception of Fantasy
    3. The Lacanian Subjects, and Ethics
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biographical and General Introduction

a. Biography

Jacques-Marie-Émile Lacan was born in Paris on April 13 1901 to a family of solid Catholic tradition, and was educated at a Jesuit school. After completing his baccalauréat he commenced studying medicine and later psychiatry. In 1927, Lacan commenced clinical training and began to work at psychiatric institutions, meeting and working with (amongst others) the famous psychiatrist Gaetan Gatian de Clerambault. His doctoral thesis, on paranoid psychosis, was passed in 1932. In 1934, he became a member of La Societe Psychoanalytique de Paris (SPP), and commenced an analysis lasting until the outbreak of the war. During the Nazi occupation of France, Lacan ceased all official professional activity in protest against those he called "the enemies of human kind." Following the war, he rejoined the SPP, and it was in the post-war period that he rose to become a renowned and controversial figure in the international psychoanalytic community, eventually banned in 1962 from the International Psychoanalytic Association for his unorthodox views on the calling and practice of psychoanalysis. Lacan's career as both a theoretician and practicioner did not end with this excommunication, however. In 1963, he founded L'Ecole Freudienne de Paris (EFP), a school devoted to the training of analysts and the practicing of psychoanalysis according to Lacanian stipulations. In 1980, having single-handedly dissolved the EFP, he then constituted the Ecole for "La Cause Freudienne," saying: "It is up to you to be Lacanians if you wish; I am Freudian." Lacan died in Paris on September 9, 1981.

b. Intellectual Biography

Lacan's first major theoretical publication was his piece "On the Mirror Stage as Formative of the I." This piece originally appeared in 1936. Its publication was followed by an extended period wherein he published little. In 1949, though, it was re-presented to wider recognition. In 1953, on the back of the success of his Rome dissertation to the SPP on "The Function and Field of Speech in Psychoanalysis," Lacan then inaugurated the seminar series that he was to continue to convene annually (albeit in different institutional guises) until his death. It was in this forum that he developed and ceaselessly revised the ideas with which his name has become associated. Although Lacan was famously ambivalent about publication, the seminars were transcribed by various of his followers, and several have been translated into English. Lacan published a selection of his most important essays in 1966 in the collection Ecrits. An abridged version of this text is available in an English-language edition (see References and Further Reading).

c. Theoretical Project

Lacan's avowed theoretical intention, from at least 1953, was the attempt to reformalize what he termed "the Freudian field." His substantial corpus of writings, speeches and seminars can be read as an attempt to unify and reground what are the four interlinking aspirations of Freud's theoretical writings:

  1. a theory of psychoanalytic practice as a curative procedure;
  2. the generation of a systematic metapsychology capable of providing the basis for
  3. the formalization of a diagnostic heuristic of mental illness; and
  4. the construction of an account of the development of the "civilized" human psyche.

Lacan brought to this project, however, a keen knowledge of the latest developments in the human sciences, drawing especially on structuralist linguistics, the structural anthropology of Claude Levi-Strauss, topology, and game theory. Moreover, as Jacques Derrida has remarked, Lacan's work is characterized by an engagement with modern philosophy (notably Descartes, Kant, Hegel, Heidegger and Sartre) unmatched by other psychoanalytic theorists, especially informed by his attendance at Andre Kojeve's hugely influential Paris lectures on Hegel from 1933-1939.

2. Lacan's Philosophical Anthropology

a. The Mirror Stage

Lacan's article "The Mirror Stage as Formative of the I" (1936, 1949) lays out the parameters of a doctrine that he never foreswore, and which has subsequently become something of a post-structuralist mantra: namely, that human identity is "decentred." The key observation of Lacan's essay concerns the behaviour of infants between the ages of 6 and 18 months. At this age, Lacan notes, children become capable of recognizing their mirror image. This is not a dispassionate experience, either. It is a recognition that brings the child great pleasure. For Lacan, we can only explain this "jubilation" as a testimony to how, in the recognition of its mirror-image, the child is having its first anticipation of itself as a unified and separate individual. Before this time, Lacan contends (drawing on contemporary psychoanalytic observation), the child is little more than a "body in bits and pieces," unable to clearly separate I and Other, and wholly dependant for its survival (for a length of time unique in the animal kingdom) upon its first nurturers.

The implications of this observation on the mirror stage, in Lacan's reckoning, are far-reaching. They turn around the fact that, if it holds, then the genesis of individuals' sense of individuation can in no way be held to issue from the "organic" or "natural" development of any inner wealth supposed to be innate within them. The I is an Other from the ground up, for Lacan (echoing and developing a conception of the ego already mapped out in Freud's Ego and Id). The truth of this dictum, as Lacan comments in "Aggressivity and Psychoanalysis," is evident in infantile transitivity: that phenomenon wherein one infant hit by another yet proclaims: "I hit him!" and visa-versa. It is more simply registered in the fact that it remains a permanent possibility of adult human experience for us to speak and think of ourselves in the second or third person. What is decisive in these phenomena, according to Lacan, is that the ego is at base an object: an artificial projection of subjective unity modelled on the visual images of objects and others that the individual confronts in the world. Identification with the ego, Lacan accordingly maintains, is what underlies the unavoidable component of aggressivity in human behaviour especially evident amongst infants, and which Freud recognised in his Three Essays on Sexuality when he stressed the primordial ambivalence of children towards their love object(s) (in the oral phase, to love is to devour; in the anal phase, it is to master or destroy…).

b. Desire is the Desire of the Other

It is on the basis of this fundamental understanding of identity that Lacan maintained throughout his career that desire is the desire of the Other. What is meant by him in this formulation is not the triviality that humans desire others, when they sexually desire (an observation which is not universally true). Again developing Freud's theorization of sexuality, Lacan's contention is rather that what psychoanalysis reveals is that human-beings need to learn how and what to desire. Lacanian theory does not deny that infants are always born into the world with basic biological needs that need constant or periodic satisfaction. Lacan's stress, however, is that, from a very early age, the child's attempts to satisfy these needs become caught up in the dialectics of its exchanges with others. Because its sense of self is only ever garnered from identifying with the images of these others (or itself in the mirror, as a kind of other), Lacan argues that it demonstrably belongs to humans to desire---directly---as or through another or others. We get a sense of his meaning when we consider such social phenomena as fashion. As the squabbling of children more readily testifies, it is fully possible for an object to become desirable for individuals because they perceive that others desire it, such that when these others' desire is withdrawn, the object also loses its allure.

Lacan articulates this decentring of desire when he contends that what has happened to the biological needs of the individual is that they have become inseparable from, and importantly subordinated to, the vicissitudes of its demand for the recognition and love of other people. Events as apparently "natural" as the passing or holding back of stool, he remarks in Ecrits, become episodes in the chronicle of the child's relationship with its parents, expressive of its compliance or rebellion. A hungry child may even refuse to eat food if it perceives that this food is offered less as a token of love than one of its parents' dissatisfaction or impatience.

In this light, Lacan's important recourse to game theory also becomes explicable. For game theory involves precisely the attempt to formalize the possibilities available to individuals in situations where their decisions concerning their wants can in principle both affect and be affected by the decisions of others. As Lacan's article in the Ecrits on the "Direction of the Treatment" spells out, he takes it that the analytic situation, as theorized by Freud around the notion of transference (see Part 2), is precisely such a situation. In that essay, Lacan focuses on the dream of the butcher's wife in Freud's Interpretation of Dreams. The said "butcher's wife" thought that she had had a dream which was proof of the invalidity of Freud's theory that dreams are always encoded wish-fulfillments. As Freud comments, however, this dream becomes explicable when one considers how, after a patient has entered into analysis, her wishes are constructed (at least in part) in relation to the perceived wishes of the analyst. In this case, at least one of the wishes expressed by the dream was the woman's wish that Freud's desire (for his theory to be correct) be thwarted. In the same way, Lacan details how the deeper unconscious wish expressed in the manifest content of the dream (which featured the woman attempting to stage a dinner party with only one piece of smoked salmon) can only be comprehended as the coded fulfilment of a desire that her husband would not fulfill her every wish, and leave her with an unsatisfied desire.

c. Oedipal Complex, Castration, Name of the Father, and the Big Other

The principle that desire is the desire of the Other is also decisive in how Lacan reformulates Freud's theory of the child's socialisation through the resolution of its Oedipal complex in its fifth or sixth year. Lacan agrees with Freud that this event is decisive both in the development of the individual, and in the aetiology of any possible subsequent mental illness. However, in trying to understand this stage of subjective development, Lacan distances himself from Freud's emphasis on the biological organ of the penis. Lacan talks instead of the phallus. What he is primarily referring to is what the child perceives it is that the mother desires. Because the child's own desire is structured by its relationships with its first nurturer (usually in Western societies the mother), it is thus the desire of the mother, for Lacan, that is the decisive stake in what transpires with the Oedipus complex and its resolution. In its first years, Lacan contends, the child devotes itself to trying to fathom what it is that the mother desires, so that it can try to make itself the phallus for the mother- a fully satisfying love-object. At around the time of its fifth or sixth desire, however, the father will normally intervene in a way that lastingly thwarts this Oedipal aspiration. The ensuing renunciation of the aspiration to be the phallic Thing for the mother, and not any physical event or its threat, is what Lacan calls castration, and it is thus a function to which he thinks both boys and girls are normally submitted.

The child's acceptance of its castration marks the resolution of its Oedipal complex, Lacan holds, again shadowing Freud. The Oedipal child remains committed to its project of trying to fathom and fulfil this desire. It accordingly (and famously) perceives the father as a rival and threat to its dearest aspirations. Because of this, in a maverick theoretical conjunction, Lacan indeed likens the father-child relation at this point (at least as it is perceived by the child) to the famous "struggle to the death for pure recognition" dramatized in Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit. In this struggle, of course, the child invariably loses. But everything turns, according to Lacanian theory, on whether this loss constitutes a violent humiliation for the child or whether, as in Hegel's account of "Lordship and Bondage," its resolution involves the founding of a pact between the parties, bound by the solemnification of mutually recognised Law.

If the castration complex is to normalize the child, Lacan argues, what the child must be made to perceive is that what satisfies or orders the desire of the mother is not any visible (imaginary) feature of the father (his obviously better physical endowments, and so on). The child must come to see that the whims of the mother are themselves ordered by a Law that exceeds and tames them. This law is what Lacan famously dubs the name (nom) of the father, trading on a felicitous homonymy in French between nom (name) and non (the "no!" to incestuous union). When the father intervenes, (at least when he is what Lacan calls the symbolic father) Lacan's argument is that he does so less as a living enjoying individual than as the delegate and spokesperson of a body of social Law and convention that is also recognised by the mother, as a socialised being, to be decisive. This body of nomoi is what Lacan calls the big Other of the child's given sociolinguistic community. Insofar as the force of its Law is what the child at castration perceives to be what moves the mother and gives the father's words their "performative force" (Austin), Lacan also calls it the "phallic order."

d. The Law and Symbolic Identification

The Law of the father is in this way theorised by Lacan as the necessary mediator between the child and the mother. A castrating acceptance of its sovereignity precipitates the child out of its ambivalent attempts to be the fully satisfying Thing for the mother. As Lacan quips, when the child accedes to castration, it accedes to the impossibility of it directly satisfying its incestous wish. If things go well, however, it will go away with "title deeds in its pocket" that guarantee that, when the time comes (and if it plays by the rules), it can at least have a satisficing substitute for its first lost love-object. What has occurred, in this event, is that the individual's imaginary identifications (or "ideal egos") that exclusively characterised its infantile years have been supplemented by an identification of an entirely different order: what Lacan calls a symbolic identification with an "ego ideal." This is precisely identification with and within something that cannot be seen, touched, devoured, or mastered: namely, the words, norms and directives of its given cultural collective. Symbolic identification is always idenification with a normatively circumscribed way of organising the social-intersubjective space within which the subject can take on its most lasting imaginary identifications: (For example, the hysterical-vulnerable female identifies at the symbolic level with the patriarchal way of structuring social relations between sexes, outside of which her imaginary identification would be meaningless).

e. Summary

So, to repeat and summarise: Lacan's philosophical anthropology (his answer to the question: what is it to be human?) involves several important reformulations of Freudian tenets. By drawing on Hegel, game theory, and contemporary observations of infant behaviour, he lays greater systematic emphasis than Freud had on the intersubjective constitution of human desire. In this feature at least, his philosophical anthropology is united with that of philosophers such as Levinas, Honneth and Habermas. Equally, since for Lacan human desire is "the desire of the other," what he contends is at stake in the child's socialisation is its aspiration to be the fully satisfying object for the mother, a function which is finally (or at least norm-ally) fulfilled by the Law-bearing words of the father. Human-being, for Lacan, is thus (as decentred) vitally a speaking animal (what he calls a parle-etre); one whose desire comes to be "inmixed" with the imperatives of, and stipulated within, the natural language of its society. [see Part 2] Particularly, Lacan picks up on certain cues within Freud's texts (and those of Saint Paul) to emphasise the dialectical structuration of human desire in relation to the prohibitions of Law. If the Law of the father denies immediate access to what the child takes to be the fully satisfying object (as expounded above), from this point on, Lacan argues, (at least neurotic) desire is necessarily articulated in the interstices of what is permitted by the big Other. And it is characterised by an innate and "fatal" attraction to what it prohibits as such, which is why he placed such central emphasis throughout his career on the enigmatic Freudian notion of a death drive.

f. Lacan's Diagnostic Categories

Finally, it should be noted that, because of Lacan's reformulations of several of Freud's key notions, Lacan's diagnostic heuristic differs markedly from Freud's. For Lacan, what is decisive in understanding mental illness is not the conflict between the embattled ego and its two more "irrational" psychic bedfellows, the superego and the id. It is how the subject bears up with respect to the condition of being a castrated animal forced to pursue its desire on "the inverted ladder of the signifier," within the phallic order of its society's big Other. The question to be asked, for Lacan, is: how fully has the subject acceded to its symbolic castration?, and- as such- how fully has it overcome the transitivity and aggressivity characteristic of the earlier infantile stages of its development?

As in Freud, Lacan stipulates three major classes of mental illness, all of which are situated by him with respect to the terms of this question, and which (as such) are elevated by him to something like three existential bearings towards the condition of being a decentred socialised animal. According to the Lacanian conceptualization, the neurotic is someone who has submitted to castration, but not without remainder. His/her symptoms stand testimony to a lasting refusal of, and resentment towards, the castrating agency of the big Other. The pervert is someone who has only partially acceded to castration. For him/her, the Law does not function wholly to repress or render inaccessible what s/he deeply desires (the maternal body). Because of this, this Law comes itself (either in its prosecution, or in its sufferance) to function as the object of her/his desire. Finally, the psychotic is someone who has never acceded (or been drawn to accede) to the symbolic order of social interchange bound by the name of the father. For him/her, this order of the big Other, in which people follow the Law "because it is the Law" can thus only ever appear to be a semblance. As is most clear in the delusions of paranoiacs, s/he will thus permanently be prey to the delusion that there must be some "Other of the big Other" (for example: aliens, the CIA, God) behind the scenes, pulling the strings of the social charade.

3. Lacan's Philosophy of Language

The component of Lacanian theory for which it is perhaps most famous, and which has most baffled its critics, is the emphasis Lacan laid on language in his attempt to formalize psychoanalysis. From the 1950s, in complete opposition to any Jungian or romantic conceptions, Lacan instead described the unconscious as a kind of discourse: the discourse of the Other.

There are at least three interrelated concerns that inform the construction of what one might call Lacan's "philosophy of language." The first is the central argument that the child's castration is the decisive point in its becoming a speaking subject. The second is his taking very seriously what might be termed the "interpretive paradigm" in Freud's texts, according to which Freud repeatedly described symptoms, slips and dreams as symbolic phenomena capable of interpretation. -The third is Lacan's desire to try to understand the efficacy of psychoanalytic interpretation as a curative procedure that relies solely on what Freud called in The Question of Lay Analysis the "magical" power of the word.

a. Language and Law

In Part 1, in recounting Lacan's view on the resolution of the Oedipal complex, one reason why Lacan allocated language such importance was touched upon. For Lacan, it is only when the child accedes to castration and the Law of the father, that s/he becomes fully competent as a language-speaker within his/her given social collective. By contrast, individuals suffering from psychosis, Lacan stresses (in line with a vast wealth of psychological research), are prone to characteristic linguistic dysfunctions and inabilities. Already from this, then, we can outline a first crucial feature of Lacan's "philosophy of language." Like the later Wittgenstein, Lacan's position is that to learn a language is to learn a set of rules or laws for the use and combination of words. Accordingly, for him too, "learning is based on believing" (Wittgenstein). Particularly, Lacan asserts a lasting link between the capacity of subjects to perceive the world as a set of discrete identifiable objects, and their acceptance of the unconditional authority of a body of convention. We will return to this below.

b. Psychoanalysis as Interpretation

Lacan's contention concerning human-being as a parle-etre, put most broadly, is that when the subject learns its mother tongue, everything from its sense of how the world is, to the way it experiences its biological body, are over-determined by its accession to this order of language. This is the clearest register of the debt that Lacan owes to phenomenology. From Heidegger, he accepts the notion that to be a subject is to experience the world as a meaningful totality, and that language is crucial to this capability. Aligning Freud with the theories of Merleau-Ponty and Sartre, Lacan developed a psychoanalytic conception of how the body is caught in the play of meaning-formation between subjects, and expressive of the subjectivity that "lives" through it, as well as being an objectificable tool for the performance of instrumental activities. For Lacan, that is, "the unconscious" does not name only some other part of the mental apparatus than consciousness. It names all that about a subject, including bodily manifestations and identifications with others and "external" objects that insist beyond his/her conscious control.

Freud had already commented in the Introductory Lectures to Psychoanalysis that the unconscious can be compared to a language without a grammar. Lacan, using structuralist linguistics, attempted to systematize this contention, arguing that the unconscious is structured like a language, and that "it speaks"/ca parle. A symptom, Lacan (for example) claimed, is to be read as a kind of embodied corporeal metaphor. As Freud had argued, he takes it that what is at stake within a symptom is a repressed desire abhorrent to the consciously accepted self-conception and values of the subject. This desire, if it is to gain satisfaction at all, accordingly needs to be expressed indirectly. For example, a residual infantile desire to masturbate may find satisfaction indirectly in a compulsive ritual the subject feels compelled to repeat.

Just as one might metaphorically describe one's love as a rose, Lacan argues, here we have a repressed desire being metaphorically expressed in some apparently dissimilar bodily activity. Equally, drawing on certain moments within Freud's papers "On the Psychology of Love," Lacan argues that desire is structured as a metonymy. In metonymy, one designates a whole object (for example, a car) by naming one part of it (for example: "a set of wheels"). Lacan's argument is that, equally, since castration denies subjects full access to their first love object (the mother), their choice of subsequent love objects is the choice of a series of objects that each resemble in part the lost object (perhaps they have the same hair, or look at him/her the same way the mother did …). According to Lacan, the unconscious uses the multivalent resources of the natural language into which the subject has been inducted (what he calls "the battery of the signifier") to give indirect vent to the desires that the subject cannot consciously avow.

Lacan's Freudian argument is that a directly comparable process occurs in formations of the unconscious as in jokes. As Freud detailed in Jokes and Their Relation to the Unconscious, the "punch line" of jokes pack their punch by condensing in one statement, or even one word, two chains of meaning. The first of these is what the previous words and cues of the joke, and our shared norms for interpretation, lead us to expect. The second is a wholly different chain of associations, whose clash with what we had expected produces our sense of amusement. In the same way, Lacan observed that, for example, when an analysand makes a "slip of the tongue," what has taken place is that the unconscious has employed such means as homonymy, the merging of two words, the forgetting or mispronunciation of certain words, or a slippage of pronoun or tense, etc., to intimate a whole chain of associations which the subject did not intend, but through which his unconscious desire is given indirect expression.

Lacan argues that what the consideration of jokes, symptoms and slips thus shows are a number of features of how it is that human beings form sense in language. The first thing is that the sentence is the absolutely basal unit of meaning. Before a sentence ends, Lacan notes, the sense of each individual word or signifier is uncertain. It is only when the sentence is completed that their sense is fixed, or---as Lacan variously put it---"quilted." Before this time, they are what he calls "floating signifiers," like to the leading premises of a joke.

The sense of this position can be easily demonstrated. One need only begin a sentence by proffering a subject, but then cease speaking before a verb and/or predicate is assigned to this in accordance with linguistic convention. For example, if I say: "when I was young I…" or "it's not like…," my interlocutor will be understandably want to know what it is that I mean. At the end of the sentence, by contrast, the sense of the beginning words becomes clear, as when I finish the first of the above utterances by saying "when I was young I ran a lot," or whatever.

This understanding of sentences as the basic unit of sense, and of how it is that signifiers "float" until any given sentence is finished, is what informs Lacan's emphasis on the future anterior tense. Sense, he argues, is always something that "will have been." It is anticipated but not confirmed, when we hear uttered the beginning of a sentence (see transference below). Or else, at sentence's end, it is something that we now see with the benefit of "twenty twenty hindsight" to have been intended all along. This is why, in Seminar I, Lacan even quips that the meaning of symptoms do not come from the past, but from the future. Before the work of interpretation, a symptom is a floating signifier, whose meaning is unclear to the analysand, and also to the analyst. As the analytic work proceeds, however, an interpretation is achieved at some later time that casts the whole behavior into relief in a wholly different light, and makes its sense clear.

c. The Curative Efficacy of the "Talking Cure"

Lacan's emphasis on language is also over-determined by an elementary recollection that, if Freud's intervention promised anything, it is that speaking with another person in strictly controlled circumstances can be a curative experience for people suffering from forms of mental illness. The analysand comes to the analyst with his troubling symptoms, and the analyst, at certain decisive points, offers interpretations of these behaviors that retrospectively make their meaning clear. And this is not simply an intellectual exercise. As Freud stressed, there is knowledge of the unconscious, and then there is knowledge that has effects upon it. A successful psychoanalytic interpretation is one that has effects even upon the biological reality of the body, changing the subject's bearing towards the world, and dissolving his/her symptoms.

The need to explain this power of words and language is a clear and lasting motive behind Lacan's understanding of language. His central and basal hypothesis concerning it can be stated in the following way. In a symptom, as we saw above, an unconscious desire seeks to make itself manifest. The symptom is recounted to the analyst, or else repeated in the way the subject responds to the analyst in the sessions. Then an interpretation is offered by the analyst, which recognizes or symbolizes the force of the desire at work in the symptom, and the symptom disappears. So here the recognition of a desire at the same time satisfies the desire. What this can accordingly only mean is that the unconscious desire given voice in the symptom is itself, from the start, at least in part a desire for recognition. This is an absolutely central Lacanian insight, wherein he again shows the influence of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit upon his most central concepts. It synchronizes exactly with the philosophical anthropology recounted above, and Lacan's stricture concerning how human desire is always caught up in the dialectics of individuals' exchanges with others.

But, for Lacan, it also shows something vital about the language in or as which the subjects' repressed desires are trying to find a vent. This is that language is above all a social pact. As Lacan wrote in the Ecrits: "As a rule everyone knows that others will remain, like himself, inaccessible to the constraints of reason, outside an acceptance in principle of a rule of debate that does not come into force without an explicit or implicit agreement as to what is called its basis, which is almost always tantamount to an anticipated agreement to what is at stake... I shall expect nothing therefore of these rules except the good faith of the Other, and, as a last resort, will make use of them, if I think fit or if I am forced to, only to amuse bad faith..." (Lacan, 2001: 154-155). Lacan's idea is that to speak is to presuppose a body a conventions that ensue that, even if my immediate auditor doesn't "get it," the true meaning of what I wish to convey always will emerge, and be registered in some "Other" place. (Note that here is another meaning of the big Other touched upon in Part 1. The big Other is the place, tribunal, collective or single person which we presuppose will register the truth of what we say, whenever we speak.)

This is why Lacan's philosophy of language is to be read in strong opposition to any philosophical account (whether Lockean, descriptivist or phenomenological) which argues that meaning is formed prior to the communicative act. Lacan defines speech as a process in which the subjects get their meanings back from the Other in an inverted form. Think once more of what is involved in psychoanalytic interpretation. Here the meaning of a symptom is rendered by the analyst. What this means, for Lacan, is that the symptom not only bears upon the subject's past relations to others. If it can be dissolved by an Other's interpretation, this is because it is formed with an eye to this interpretation from the start. To quote Slavoj Zizek on this Lacanian notion of how the symptom is from the start addressed to an Other supposed to know its truth: "The symptom arises where the world failed, where the circuit of symbolic communication was broken: it is a kind of "prolongation of communication by other means'": the failed, repressed word articulates itself in a coded, ciphered form.

The implication of this is that the symptom can not only be interpreted but is, so to speak, formed with an eye to its interpretation … in the psychoanalytic cure the symptom is always addressed to the analyst, it is an appeal to him to deliver its hidden message … This … is the basic point: in its very constitution, the symptom implies the field of the big Other as consistent, complete, because its very formation is an appeal to the Other which contains its meaning …" (Zizek, 1989: 73). Even the key meaning of transference, for Lacan, is this supposition that there is an Other supposed to know the truth of my communicative acts, even down to the most apparently meaningless "slips" and symptomatic behaviours. In terms of the previous section, transference is the condition of possibility for the quilting of the meaning of floating signifiers that occurs even in the most basic sentences, as we saw. What occurs in a psychoanalytic interpretation is simply one more consequential version of this process. The subject, by speaking, addresses himself to some Other supposed to know her/his truth, and at the end of this process, the signifiers he offers to the Other are quilted, and return to him "in an inverted form."

What has occurred at this point, on Lacan's reckoning, is that the previously unquilted signifiers finding voice in the manifestations of his unconscious are integrated into the subject's symbolic universe: the way s/he understands the world, in the terms of his/her community's natural language. They have been subjectivised; which means that now s/he can recognise them as not wholly alien intrusions into his/her identity, but an integral part of this identity. Lacan's stress is thus always, when he talks of psychoanalytic interpretation, that this interpretation does not add new content to the subject's self-understanding, so much as affect the form of this understanding. An interpretation, that is, realigns the way the s/he sees her past, reordering the signifiers in which his/her self-understanding has come to be ordered. A crucial Lacanian category in theorising this process is that of the "master signifier." Master signifiers are those signifiers to which a subject's identity are most intimately bound. Standard examples are words like "Australian," "democrat," "decency," "genuineness." They are words which will typically be proffered by subjects as naming something like what Kant would have called ends in themselves. They designate values and ideals that the subject will be unwilling and unable to question without pulling the semantic carpet from beneath their own feet.

Lacan's understanding of how these "master signifiers" function is a multi-layered one, as we shall see in more detail in Part 3. It is certainly true to say, though, that the importance of these signifiers comes from how a subject's identification with them commits them to certain orderings of all the rest of the signifiers. For example, if someone identifies himself as a "communist," the meanings of a whole array of other signifiers are ordered in quite different ways than for someone who thinks of himself as a "liberal." "Freedom" for him comes to mean "freedom from the exploitative practices enshrined in capitalism and hidden beneath liberal ideological rhetoric." "Democracy" comes to mean "the dictatorship of the proletariat." "Equality" comes to mean something like "what ensues once the sham of the capitalist "equal right to trade" is unmasked."

What Lacan argues is involved in the psychoanalytic process, then, is the elevation of new "master signifiers" which enable the subject to reorder their sense of themselves and of their relations to others. Previously, for example, a person may have identified with a conception of "decency" that has led him to repress aspects of his own libidinal makeup, which then return in neurotic symptoms. What analysis will properly lead him to do is identify himself with a different set of "master signifiers," which re-signify the signifiers he had unconsciously been addressing to the Other in his symptoms, reducing their traumatic charge by integrating them into his symbolic (self-)understanding.

4. Lacanian Psychoanalysis and Philosophy of Ethics

Whereas Freud never systematically spoke on the ethics of psychoanalysis, Lacan devoted his pivotal seventh seminar (in 1959-1960) to precisely this topic. Seminar VII: The Ethics of Psychoanalysis goes to some lengths to stress that the position on ethics Lacan is concerned to develop is concerned solely with the clinical practice of psychoanalysis. Its central topic, in line with what we examined in Part 1 concerning the intersubjective structuration of subjective desire and identity, is the desire of the analyst as that Other addressed by the patient and implicated in the way s/he structures his/her desire through the transference. Nevertheless, it remains that Lacan develops his position through explicit engagement with Aristotle's Nichomachean Ethics, as well as Kant's practical writings, and the texts of Marquis de Sade. Moreover, Lacan's ethics accord with his metapsychological premises, examined in Section 2, and his theorization of language, examined in Section 3.

In this Section 4, accordingly, we will see Lacan's understanding of ethics as a sophisticated position that, disavowals notwithstanding, can be read as a consistent post-Kantian philosophy of ethics. Section 4 is divided into three sub-sections. The first two develop further Lacan's metapsychological and philosophical tenets. The first sub-section involves a further elaboration of the Lacanian conception of the "master signifiers." The second sub-section involves an exposition of Lacan's notion of the "fundamental fantasy." The final sub-section then examines Lacan's later notion of "traversing the fantasy" as the basis of his ethical position.

a. Master Signifiers, and the Decentred Nature of Belief

As I stated at the end of Part 2, Lacan assigns great importance in his theorization of the psychoanalytic process to what he calls "master signifiers." These are those signifiers that the subject most deeply identifies with, and which accordingly have a key role in the way s/he gives meaning to the world. As was stressed, Lacan's idea about these signifiers is that their primary importance is less any positive content that they add to the subject's field of symbolic sense. It is rather the efficacy they have in reorienting the subject with respect to all of the other signifiers which structure his/her sense of herself and the world. It is precisely this primarily structural or formal function that underlies the crucial Lacanian claim that master signifiers are actually "empty signifiers" or "signifiers without a signified."

As with all of Lacan's key formulations, the notion that the master signifiers are "signifiers without signified" is a complex one. Even the key idea is the following. The concept or referent (or both) signified by any "master signifier" will always be something impossible for any one individual to fully comprehend. For example, "Australian-ness" would seem to be what is aimed at when someone proffers the self-identification: "I am an Australian." The Lacanian question here is: what is "Australian" being used by the subject to designate here? Is "Australian-ness" something that inheres in everyone who is born in Australia? Or is it a characteristic that is passed on through the medium of culture primarily? Does it, perhaps, name most deeply some virtues or qualities of character all Australians supposedly have? However, even if we take it that all "Australians" share some basic virtues, which are these? Can a closed list everyone would agree upon be feasibly drawn up? Is it not easy to think of other peoples who share in valuing each individual trait we standardly call "Australian" (for example: courage, disrespect for pomposity)? And, since "Australian" would seem to have to aim at a singular entity, not a collection, or else some grounding quality of character that could perhaps unite all of the others, which is this? And is this "essential" quality- again- simply biological, perhaps genetic, or is it metaphysical, or what?

What Lacan's account of "master signifiers" thus emphasizes is the gap between two things. The first is our initial certainty about the nature of such an apparently obvious thing as "Australian-ness." (We may even get vexed when asked by someone). The second thing is the difficulty that we have of putting this certainty into words, or naming something that would correspond to the "essence" of "Australian-ness," beneath all the different appearances.

What Lacan indeed argues, in line with his emphasis on the decentred self, is that our ongoing and usually unquestioning use of these words represents another clear case of how the construction of sense depends on the transferential supposition of "Others supposed to know." Though we ourselves can never simply state what "Australian-ness," etc. is, that is, Lacan argues that what is nevertheless efficient in generating our belief in (and identification with) this elusive "thing" is a conviction that nevertheless other people certainly know its nature, or seem to. Just as we desire through the Other, for this reason Lacanian theory also maintains that belief is always belief through an Other. (For example, in the Christian religion, priests would be the designated Others supposed to know the meaning of the Christian mystery vouchsafing believers' faith.)

At this point, it is appropriate to recall from Part 1 Lacan's thesis that castration marks the point wherein the child is made to renounce its aspiration to be the phallic Thing for the mother. A subject's castration amounts at base, for Lacan, to the acceptance that it is the injunctions of the father- and through his name the conventions of the big Other of society- that govern the desire of the mother. The "master signifiers" are also what Lacan calls phallic signifiers. The reason is exactly that- despite the difficulty of locating any simple referent for them- they nevertheless are the words that seem to intimate to subjects what "really matters" about human existence. While no Christian believer may know what "God" is, nevertheless s/he will be in no doubt of the transcendent importance of whatever It is that this word names.

Lacan thus is drawing together his philosophical anthropology and his theorization of language when he defends the position that it is the consequence of "castration" that subjects are debarred from immediate knowledge of what it is that the "phallic signifiers" signify. He is also arguing, in the psychoanalytic field, a position profoundly akin to the Kantian postulation that finite human subjects are debarred from immediate access to things in themselves. Lacan's argument is that it is this lost "signified," which would as it were be "more real" than the other things that the subject can readily signify, that is what is primordially repressed when the subject accedes to becoming a speaking subject at castration. When the subject accedes to the symbolic, he repeats, the Real of aspired-to incestuous union, and the sexualized transgressive enjoyment or jouissance it would afford, is necessarily debarred.

b. Lacan's Conception of Fantasy

If the neurotic subject does not to forego the Oedipal supposition that there is some Thing that would fully satisfy the desire of the mother, it is because s/he constructs fantasies about the nature of this lost Thing, and how s/he stands towards it. The primary means s/he deploys in this process is what we recounted above, when we noted how the difficulty in knowing the referent of the phallic master signifiers obliges subjects to construct their beliefs concerning it in a "decentred" manner, through the Others. While the subject accepts that the Real phallic Thing is lost to him/her, that is, in his/her fantasmatic life s/he yet supposes that there are Others who do know what it is that phallic signifiers refer to, and have more direct access to the Real of jousissance. In line with this, Lacan's further argument is indeed that the deepest fantasmatic postulation of subjects is always that the Real Phallic Thing that s/he has been debarred from must be held in reserve by the "big Other" whose law it is that discernibly structures the mother's desire.

What follows from this is the position that the manifestations of the unconscious represent small unconscious rebellions of subjects against the losses that they take themselves to have endured when they acceded to socialization. They are all under-girded by the more basic fantasmatic structuration of identity as constituted by the loss endured at castration. This is why Lacan talks of a fundamental fantasy, and argues that it is above all this fundamental fantasy that is at stake in psychoanalysis.

Lacan strived to formalize the invariant structure of this "fundamental fantasy" in the matheme: $ a. This matheme indicates that: "$," the "barred" subject which is divided by castration between attraction to and repulsion from the Object of its unconscious desire, is correlative to ('') the fantasised lost object. This object, designated in the matheme as "a," is called by Lacan the "object petit a," or else the object cause of desire. Lacan holds that the subject always stabilizes its position with respect to the Real Thing by constructing a fantasy about how the debarred Thing is held in the big Other, manifesting only in a series of metonymic or partial objects (the gaze or voice of his/her love objects, a hair style, or some other "little piece of the Real") that can be enjoyed as compensation for its primordial loss of the maternal Thing.

Lacan's argument is that the fundamental psychological "gain" from the fundamental fantasy is the following. The fundamental fantasy represents what occurred at castration in the terms of a narrative of possession and loss. This fantasm thus consoles the subject by positing that s/he at one point did have the phallic Thing, but that then, at castration, it was taken away from him/her by the Other. What this of course means is that, since the Thing was taken away from the subject, perhaps also It can be regained by him/her. It is this promise, Lacan maintains, that usually structures neurotic human desire. What the fantasy serves to hide from the subject, then, is the possibility that a fully satisfying sexual relationship with the mother, or any metonymic substitute for her, is not only prohibited, but was never possible anyway. As I recounted in Part 1, the Lacanian view, which is informed by observation of infantile behavior, is that the mother-child relationship before castration is not Edenic, but characterized by imaginary transitivity and aggressivity.

This is why Lacan quips in Seminar XX that "there is no such thing as a sexual relationship" and elsewhere that the "Woman," with a capital "W," "does not exist." Note then that the deepest logic of castration, according to Lacan, is a profoundly paradoxical one. The "no!" of the father prohibits something that is impossible. Its very prohibition, however, gives rise in the subject to the fantasmatic supposition that the Thing in question is one that is attainable but only being debarred. Lacan thus asserts that the fundamental fantasy is there to veil from the subject the terminal nature of its loss at castration. This is not simply a speculation, however. It is supported by telling evidences that he adduces.

The key point that supports Lacan's position is the stipulation the objet petit is an anamorphotic object. What this means can be seen by looking at even the most well-known exemplar of the Lacanian objet petit a: the "object gaze." Contrary to how it is sometimes read, the Lacanian "gaze" is anything but the intrusive and masterful male gaze on the world. For Lacan, gaze is indeed a "blind spot" in the subject's perception of visible reality, "disturbing its transparent visibility" (Zizek, 1999a: 79). What it bears witness to is the subject's inability to fully frame the objects that appear within his/her field of vision. The classic example of the object-gaze from Lacan's Four Fundamental Concepts of Psychoanalysis is the floating skull at the feet of Holbein's Ambassadors. What is singular about this "thing" is that it can literally only be seen from "awry," and at the cost that the rest of the picture appears at that moment out of focus. From this point on the canvas, Lacan comments, it is as if the painting regards us. What he means is that the skull reminds us that we, and with us our desires and fantasies, are implicated in how the scene appears.

Here then is another meaning to $ a: the objet petit a, for Lacan, as something that can only operate its fascination upon individuals who bear a partial perspective upon it, is that object that "re-presents" the subject within the world of objects that it takes itself to be a wholly "external" perspective upon. If a subject thus happens upon it too directly, it disappears, or else---as in psychosis and the well-known filmic motif of what happens when one encounter one's double---the cost is that one's usual sense of how the rest of the world is must dissipate. What this indicates is that the object petit a, or at least the fascinating effect the object which bears it has upon the subject who is under its thrall, has no "objective" reality independently of this subject. The logical consequence of this, though, as Lacan stipulates, is that this supposedly "lost" object can never really have been lost by the subject, since s/he can never have possessed it in the first place. This is why Lacan argues the apparently chimerical position that the objet petit a is by definition an object that has come into being in being lost.

c. The Lacanian Subjects, and Ethics

Lacan argues that the subject is "the subject of the signifier." One meaning of this claim at least is that there is no subject proper that is not a speaking subject, who has been subject to castration and the law of the father. I shall return to this formulation below, though, for its full meaning only becomes evident when another crucial claim that Lacan makes concerning the subject is properly examined. This is the apparently contradictory claim that the subject as such, at the same time as being a linguistic subject, lacks a signifier. There is no subject without language, Lacan wants to say, and yet the subject constitutively lacks a place in language.

At the broadest level, in this claim Lacan is simply restating in the language of structuralist linguistics a claim already made by Sartre, and before him Kojeve and Hegel (and arguably Kant). This is the claim that the subject is not an object capable of being adequately named within a natural language, like other objects can be ("table," "chair," or so on). It is no-thing. One of the clearest points of influence of Kojeve's Heideggerian Hegelianism on Lacan is the emphasis he places on the subject as correlative to a lack of being (manqué-a-etre/want-to-be), especially in the 1950's. Lacan articulates his position concerning the subject by way of a fundamental distinction between the ego or "moi"/"me" and the subject intimated by the shifter "je"/"I." The subject is a split subject, Lacan claims, not only insofar as---Freud dixit---it has consciousness and an unconscious.

When Lacan says the subject is split, he means also that, as a subject of language, it will always evince the following two levels. The first is the ego, or subject of the enunciated. This is the self wherein the subject perceives/anticipates its imaginary unity. Since the ego is an object, according to Lacan, it is capable of being predicated about like any other object. I can say of myself more or less truthfully that "I am fat," or "honest," or anything else. What my enunciated sentence will speak about in these cases, for Lacan, is my ego.

But this is to be distinguished from a second "level" of subjectivity: the subject of the enunciation. Here as elsewhere, Lacan's position turns around his philosophy of language examined in detail in Part 2. The distinction between the subject of the enunciation and the subject of the enunciated follows from Lacan's understanding of what "speech-act" theorists like Austin or John Searle would call the "performative dimension" to language. Speech-act theorists emphasise that the words of given speech-acts are never enunciated in a vacuum. They are always uttered in a certain context, between language speakers. And through the utterances, subjects effectively do things (hence Austin's title How to Do Things With Words). This is particularly evident in cases like commands or promises. When I make a promise (say: I promise I'll meet you at 5:15) I do not primarily make a claim about an existing state of affairs. It is what I have done that matters. What I have done is make a pledge to meet you at some future time.

Lacan's key argument, alongside that of Austin here, is that all linguistic acts have two important dimensions. The first is what Austin would call the constative dimension. Lacan calls this the level of what is enunciated. Words aim to express or represent factual states of affairs in the world. The second is the performative dimension, that Lacan calls the "level of the enunciation." The subject of the unconscious is the subject of the enunciation, Lacan insists. This is one way he expresses the elementary Freudian hypothesis that, in symptoms and parapraxes, the subject says more than s/he intended to say. What s/he intended will usually be captured in the explicit content of what s/he has enunciated. Nevertheless, in his/her body language, or in a second chain of signification indicated by her/his mispronunciation (etc.), something other than what s/he intended will be conveyed to the analyst. This second chain of signification as it were "happens"- it is performed for the "Other supposed to know" before it can be explicitly and consciously enunciated by the speaking individual.

Lacan's distinction between the subject of the enunciated and the subject of the enunciated can be exposed further through examining his treatment of the liar paradox. This is the paradox of someone saying: "I am a liar." The paradox is that, if we suppose the proposition true ("person x is a liar"), we at the same time then have no reason to believe he is telling the truth when he says: "I am a liar." As a liar, he can only be lying when he says this. But what this means is that we must suppose that he is a sincere truth-telling person. Lacan argues that this is a paradox only insofar as we have wrongly collapsed the distinction between the subject enunciated in the sentence, and the subject of the enunciation. A better understanding of the meaning of this utterance can be garnered by presenting the speech-act in both its two dimensions, as a case wherein (to formalize): person x says: "I am a liar." The point is that the "I" in the spoken sentence here is what Lacan calls "the subject of the enunciated." Of this ego, it may (or may not) be true that s/he is a liar. Yet, this ego is in no way to be identified with what we have called "person x" in the above formalization. "Person x" here is not the subject spoken about. S/he is the person speaking. And Lacan's point is that it this subject of the enunciation that addresses itself to the Other supposed to know in analysis, despite whatever egoic plays and ploys the analysand might masquerade before his/her analyst in what s/he enunciates. The hysteric, Lacan thus says, is someone who tells the truth about his/her desire (at the level of enunciation) in the guise of lying or at least being indifferent to the factual truths of which she speaks (at the level of the enunciated). The obsessional, by contrast, lies or dissembles the truth of his/her involvement in what s/he speaks about (at the level of enunciation) in the guise of always telling the truth (at the level of what s/he enunciates).

Lacan's position is that, when subjects wish to speak about themselves, the subject of enunciation is always either anticipated- at the beginning of the speech-act; or else missed- at the end of the speech-act, whence it has come to be falsely identified with the ego. In line with his prioritization of the future anterior, he comments that the subject always "will have been." In philosophical terms, we can say that the Lacanian subject is a presupposition of any speech-act (someone will always be speaking), yet impossible to fill out with any substantial content.

It is for this reason that Slavoj Zizek has recently drawn a parallel between it and Kant's unity of apperception in The Critique of Pure Reason. Lacan himself, in his seminar on the logic of fantasy, strove to articulate his meaning by a revision of Descartes' famous cogito ergo sum: "I am not where I think." The key to this formulation is the opposition between thinking and being. Lacan is saying that, at the point of my thought and speech (the subject of enunciation), there I have no substantial being that could be known. Equally, "I am not where I think" draws out the necessary misapprehension of the nature of the subject in what s/he enunciates. If Lacan's subject thus seems a direct psychoanalytic restatement of Sartre/Kojeve's position, however, it needs to be read in conjunction with his doctrines concerning the "master signifier" and the "fundamental fantasy." Lacan says that master signifiers "represent the subject for other signifiers."

Given his identification of the subject with a lack of being, a first register of this remark becomes clear. The master signifiers, as examined above, have no particular enunciated content or signified, according to Lacan. But the Lacanian position is precisely that this lack of enunciated content is correlative to the subject. In this way, his theorisation of the subject depends not only on a phenomenological analysis, as (for example) Sartre's does in Being and Nothingness. If the subject is the subject "of the lack of the signifier," Lacan means not only that it cannot be objectified at the point of its thinking, as I examined above. The subject is---directly---something that emerges at the point of- and because of- a lack in the field of signification, on his reckoning. This was already intimated above, in the section on the "logics of the fantasy," which recounted Lacan's position concerning how it is that subjects develop regimes of fantasy concerning what Others are supposed to know in order to ground their own belief in, and identification with, the master signifiers. The point to be emphasised now is that these master signifiers, if they are to function, cannot do without this subjective investment of fantasy. Lacan's famous claim there is no metalanguage is meant to imply only this: that there is no field of sense that can be "quilted," and attain to a semblance of consistency, unless subjects have invested their partial, biased perspective upon that field.

This is even the final and most difficult register to what Lacan aimed to express in the matheme: $ a. As we saw in Part 3, ii., the subject is correlative to the fantasmatically posed lost object/referent of the master signifiers. We can now state a further level of what Lacan implied in this matheme, though. This is that in fantasy what subjects misrecognize is not simply the non-existence of the incestuous-maternal Thing. What subjects primordially repress is the necessity of subjects' implication in the play of signification that has over-determined the symbolic coordinates of their lives. The archetypal neurotic subject-position, Lacan notes, is one of victimization. It is the Others who have sinned, and not the subject. S/he has only suffered.

What is of course occluded by these considerations (which may be right or wrong from a moral or legal perspective) is how the subject has invested him/herself in the events of his/her life. Firstly, there is the fantasmatic investment of the subject in the "Others supposed to enjoy," who are supposed not to have been made to undergo the castrating losses that s/he has undergone. As Lacan reads Freud's later postulation of the superego, this psychical agency is constructed around residual fantasies of the Oedipal father supposed to have access to the sovereign jouissance of the mother's body denied to the child. Secondly, what is occluded is what Freud already theorised when he spoke of subjects' adaption to and "gain" from their illness, as a way of organising their access to jouissance in defiance of the demands of the big Other. Even if the subject has undergone the most frightful trauma, Lacan argues, what matters is how this trauma has come to be signified subsequently and retrospectively by the subject around the fundamental fantasy. S/he must be made to avow that the subject-position they have taken up towards their life is something that they have subjectified, and have an ongoing stake in.

This is why, in Seminar II, Lacan quips that the injunction of psychoanalysis is mange ton dasein!- eat your existence! He means that at the close of the analysis, the subject should come to internalise and so surpass the way that it has so far organised your life and relations to Others. It is this point, accordingly, that the ethics of Lacanian psychoanalysis is announced. Lacan's name for what occurs at the end of the cure is traversing the fantasy. But since what the fantasy does, for Lacan, is veil from the subject his/her own implication in and responsibility for how s/he experiences the world, to traverse the fantasy is to reavow subjective responsibility. To traverse the fantasy, Lacan theorizes, is to cease positing that the Other has taken the "lost" object of desire. It is to accept that this object is something posited by oneself as a means to compensate for the experienced trauma of castration. One comes to accept that castration is not an event with a winner (the father) and a loser (the subject), but a structurally necessary factum for human-beings as such, to which all speaking subjects have been subjected. What equally follows is the giving up of the resentful and acquisitive project of trying to reclaim the objet petit a from the Other, and "settling the scores."

This gives way to an identification with the place of this object that is at once within the fabric of the world, and yet which stands out from it. (Note that this is one Lacanian reading of "where It was, there I shall be"). The subject who has traversed the fantasy, for Lacan, is the subject who has not ceded on its desire. This desire is no longer fixed by the coordinates of the fundamental fantasy. S/he is able to accept that the fully satisfying sexual object, that which would fulfil the sovereign desire of the mother, does not exist. S/he is thus equally open to accepting that the big Other, and/or any concrete Other supposed by the subject to be its authoritive representative(s), does not have what s/he has "lost." Lacan puts this by saying that what the subject can now avow is that the Other does not Exist: that it, too, lacks, and what it does and wants depends upon the interventions of the subject. The subject is, finally, able to thereby accept that what it took to be its place in the order of the Other is not a finally fixed thing. It can now avow without reserve that it is a lacking subject, or, as Lacan will also say, a subject of desire, but that the metonymic sliding of this desire has no final term. Rather than being ceaselessly caught in the lure of the object-cause of desire, this desire is now free to circle around on itself, as it were, and desire only itself, in what is a point of strange final proximity between Lacan and the Nietzcheanism he scarcely ever mentioned in his works.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Lacan, Jacques. Ecrits trans. Alan Sheridan (London: Routledge, 2001).
  • Lacan, Jacques. The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book I trans. John Forrester. Edited by J.A. Miller (Cambridge: Cambridge Uni. Press, 1988).
  • Lacan, Jacques. The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book II trans. Sylvana Tomaselli. Edited by J.A. Miller (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988).
  • Lacan, Jacques. The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book III: The Psychoses trans. Russell Grigg. Edited by J.A. Miller (W. Norton: Kent, 2000).
  • Lacan, Jacques. The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book VII: The Ethics of Psychoanalysis trans. Dennis Porter (New York: Norton, 1992).
  • Lacan, Jacques. SeminarXX: Encore! Trans. Bruce Fink (W. Norton: New York, 1975).
  • Zizek, Slavoj. The Sublime Object Of Ideology (London: Verso, 1989).
  • Zizek, Slavoj. Looking Awry: An Introduction to Lacan Through Popular Culture (Cambridge: Mass.: MIT Press, 1991).
  • Zizek, Slavoj. Enjoy Your Symptom! Jacques Lacan in Hollywood (London and New York, 1992).

Author Information

Matthew Sharpe
University of Melbourne

Laozi (Lao-tzu, fl. 6th c. B.C.E.)

laoziLaozi is the name of a legendary Daoist philosopher, the alternate title of the early Chinese text better known in the West as the Daodejing, and the moniker of a deity in the pantheon of organized “religious Daoism” that arose during the later Han dynasty (25-220 CE). Laozi is the pinyin Romanization for the Chinese characters which mean "Old Master." Laozi is also known as Lao Tan ("Old Tan") in early Chinese sources (see Romanization systems for Chinese terms). The Zhuangzi is the first text to use Laozi as a personal name and to identify Laozi and Lao Tan. The earliest materials associated with Laozi are in the Zhuangzi’s Inner Chapters. The Outer Chapters of that work have ten logia in which Laozi is the main figure, four of which contain direct attacks on the Confucian virtues of ren, yi, and li that are reminiscent of passages from the Daodejing and probably date from the period in which that collection was reaching some near final form. The earliest ascription of authorship of the Daodejing to Laozi is in Han Feizi and the Huainanzi, but several themes from the Laozi logia of the Zhuangzi are traceable into the Daodejing and on at least two occasions in that text Laozi counsels following dao (the Way) to possess de (virtue). Laozi became a principal figure in institutionalized religious forms of Daoism. He was often associated with many transformations and incarnations of the dao itself.

Table of Contents

1. Laozi and Lao Tan in Early Sources
2. Laozi and the Daodejing
3. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing
4. The First Biography and the Establishment of Laozi as the Founder of Daoism
5. The Laozi Myth
6. Select Bibliography

1. Laozi and Lao Tan in Early Sources

Zhuangzi gives the following, probably fictional, account of Confucius's impression of Laozi:

"Master, you've seen Lao Tan—what estimation would you make of him?" Confucius said, "At last I may say that I have seen a dragon—a dragon that coils to show his body at its best, that sprawls out to display his patterns at their best, riding on the breath of the clouds, feeding on the yin and yang. My mouth feel open and I couldn't close it; my tongue flew up and I couldn't even stammer. How could I possibly make any estimation of Lao Tan!" Zhuangzi, Ch. 14

According to The Book of Rites (Li ji), a master known as Lao Tan was an expert on mourning rituals. On four occasions, Confucius (kongzi, Master Kong) is reported to have responded to questions by appealing to answers given by Lao Tan. The records say that Confucius once assisted him in a burial service.

In the Zhuangzi (late 4th century BCE), Lao Tan is usually a critic of Confucius. This is the first text to use Laozi as a personal name and to identify Laozi and Lao tan. The Zhuangzi contains materials from a teacher known as Zhuang Zhou who lived between 370-300 BCE, according to Sima Qian. Chapters 1-7 of the present 33 are those most often ascribed to Zhuangzi (meaning Master Zhuang). Guo Xiang edited the text in the first half of the 3rd Cent. CE. He had 52 sections handed down to him. He rejected the material he thought was inferior and spurious, keeping 33 chapters which he divided into the "inner chapters" (chs. 1-7), "outer chapters" (chs. 8-22) and "mixed chapters," (chs. 23-33). Aside from chs. 1-7, the remaining 26 had origins other than Zhuang Zhou and they sometimes take different points of view. In the citations below, I have followed the practice of prefacing the chapter with its literary critical designation (that is, inner, outer, mixed). These designations are oversimplified textually and arguable, but at least some acknowledgment of where they are located in this textual system may help one understand that some of the passages come from different time periods and have specific polemical agendas.

Assuming that Lao Tan and Laozi are the same figure and counting the one dialogue in Mixed Ch. 27 attributed to Lao Laizi as Laozi, then there are eighteen (18) passages in which Laozi plays a role in the Zhuangzi. It is on the basis on Inner Chapter 3, The Secret of Caring for Life that we identify Lao Tan and Laozi. The passage begins "When Lao Tan died" but then when his disciple Ch'in Shih is attacked by his fellow students for only making three cries and then leaving the funeral hall, the text calls them "Laozi's disciples." Ch'in Shih's defense is "Your master happened to come because it was his time, and he happened to leave because things follow along. If you are content with the time and willing to follow along, then grief and joy have no way to enter." His association of the dead master with the students who are Laozi's disciples, and the opening of the chapter makes the identification of Lao Tan and Laozi pretty clear. Then, there are dialogues in which Lao Tan and Laozi are used interchangeably (see Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven and Mixed Ch. 27, Imputed Words). Other biographically significant material includes a reference to Laozi's being the keeper of the Royal Archives of the house of Zhou in Outer Ch. 13, The Way of Heaven.

Laozi's relationship to Confucius is also a major part of the Zhuangzi's picture of the philosopher. Of the eighteen passages mentioning Laozi, Confucius figures as a dialogical partner or subject in nine (9). While it is clear that Confucius is thought to have a long way to go to become a zhen ren (the Zhuangzi's way of speaking about the true man), Lao Tan seems to feel sorry for Confucius in his reply to "No-Toes" in Inner Chapter 5, The Sign of Virtue Complete. He recommends seeking to release Confucius from the fetters of his tendency to make rules and human discriminations (e.g., right/wrong; beautiful/ugly).

Lao Tan addresses Confucius by his personal name "Ch'iu" in three passages. Since such a liberty is one that only a person with seniority and authority would take, this style invites us to believe that Confucius was a student of Lao Tan's and acknowledged him as an authority. However, continuing the theme that Laozi taught Confucius, who was confused and having no success, we should note that the point of the story that mentions Laozi's occupation as an archivist is that Confucius' writings, offered to Laozi by Confucius himself, are simply not worthy to be put into the library. And on another occasion, Confucius claims that he knows the "six classics" thoroughly and that he has tried to persuade 72 kings to their truth, but they have been unmoved. Laozi's reply is, "Good!" He tells Confucius not to occupy himself with such worn out ways, and to live the dao himself (Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven).

Another important set of exchanges occurs between Laozi and Confucius over the latter's principal ideas of benevolence (ren) and righteousness (yi). Laozi tells Confucius to forget this teaching and be natural: "Why these flags of benevolence and righteousness so bravely upraised, as though you were beating a drum and searching for a lost child? Ah, you will bring confusion to the nature of man!" (Outer Ch. 13, The Way of Heaven)

Finally, in Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven, Lao Tan makes a direct attack not only on the rules and regulations of Confucius, but also the teachings of the Mohists, and the veneration of the ancient emperors and legendary sages of the past.

2. Laozi and the Daodejing

The Daodejing (hereafter, DDJ) has 81 chapters and over 5,000 Chinese characters, depending on which text is used. Its two major divisions are the dao jing (chs. 1-37) and the de jing (chs. 38-81). Actually, this division probably rests on nothing other than the fact that the principal concept opening Chapter 1 is dao (way) and that of Chapter 38 is de (virtue). Nonetheless, the text has been studied by literary critics for centuries. In spite of the long standing tradition that the text had a single author named Laozi, it is clear that the work is a collection of short aphorisms. Most of these probably circulated orally perhaps even singly or in small collections.

For almost 2,000 years, the Chinese text used by commentators in China and upon which all except the most recent Western language translations were based has been called the Wang Bi, after the commentator who used a complete edition of the DDJ sometime between 226-249 CE. Although Wang Bi was not a Daoist, his commentary became a standard interpretive guide, and generally speaking even today scholars depart from it only when they can make a compelling argument for doing so. Based on recent archaeological finds at Guodian in 1993 and Mawangdui in the 1970s we are certain that there were several simultaneously circulating versions of the Daodejing text.

Mawangdui is the name for a site of tombs discovered near Changsha in Hunan province. The Mawangdui discoveries consist of two incomplete editions of the DDJ on silk scrolls (boshu) now simply called "A" and "B." These versions have two principal differences from the Wang Bi. Some word choice divergencies are present. The order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the Mawangdui versions. More precisely, the order of the Mawangdui texts takes the traditional 81 chapters and sets them out like this: 38, 39, 40, 42-66, 80, 81, 67-79, 1-21, 24, 22, 23, 25-37. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu, Te-tao Ching. Contemporary scholarship associates the Mawangdui versions with a type of Daoism known as the Way of the Yellow Emperor and the Old Master (Huanglao Dao), since the Yellow Emperor was venerated alongside of Laozi as a patron of the teachings of Daoism. The prevailing view is that the present version of the DDJ probably reached its final form at the Qixia Academy of the Ji kingdom associated with Huanglao Daoism around the beginning of the 3rd century BCE.

The Guodian find consists of 730 inscribed bamboo slips found near the village of Guodian in Hubei province in 1993. There are 71 slips with material that is also found in 31 of the 81 chapters of the DDJ and corresponding to Chapters 1-66. It may date as early as c. 300 BCE. If this is a correct date, then the Daodejing was already extant in a written form when the "inner chapters" (see below) of the Zhuangzi were composed. These slips contain more significant variants from the Wang Bi than the Mawangdui versions.

Thus, there is really no scholarly support for the idea that the text was written by a single author, and certainly not by a person named Laozi. Having said this, it is true that twice in the Outer Chapters there are extensive passages in which Lao Tan makes remarks that are very close parallels to the Daodejing. The most prominent of these is Outer Ch. 33, The World. "Lao Tan said, 'Know the male but cling to the female; become the ravine of the world. Know the pure but cling to the dishonor; become the valley of the world.' He said, 'What is brittle will be broken, what is sharp will be blunted.'"

Perhaps these allusions lie behind the fact that both the Han Feizi and Huainanzi (180-122 BCE) attribute the authorship of the Daodejing to Laozi. Then, in Sima Qian's biography of Laozi, he not only says that Laozi was the author of the Daodejng, but he explains that it was a written text of his teachings given when he departed China to go to the West. So, by the 1st Cent. BCE, this was accepted. Any discussion of Laozi's philosophy, is inseparable from a discussion of the Daodejing.

3. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing

The term Dao means a road, and is often translated as "the Way". This is because sometimes dao is used as a nominative (that is, "the dao") and other times as a verb (i.e. daoing). Dao is the process of reality itself, the way things come together, while still transforming. All this reflects the deep seated Chinese belief that change is the most basic character of things. In the Yi jing (Classic of Change) the patterns of this change are symbolized by figures standing for 64 relations of correlative forces and known as the hexagrams. Dao is the alteration of these forces, most often simply stated as yin and yang. The Xici is a commentary on the Yi jing formed in about the same period as the DDJ. It takes the taiji (Great Ultimate) as the source of correlative change and associates it with the dao. The contrast is not between what things are or that something is or is not, but between chaos (hundun) and the way reality is ordering (de). Yet, reality is not ordering into one unified whole. It is the 10,000 things (wanwu). There is the dao but not "the World" or "the cosmos" in a Western sense.

The Daodejing teaches that humans cannot fathom the Dao, because any name we give to it cannot capture it. It is beyond what we can conceive (ch.1). Those who wu wei may become one with it and thus obtain the dao. Wu wei is a difficult notion to translate. Yet, it is generally agreed that the traditional rendering of it as "nonaction" or "no action" is incorrect. Those who wu wei do act. Daoism is not a philosophy of "doing nothing." Wu wei means something like "act naturally," "effortless action," or "nonwillful action." The point is that there is no need for human tampering with the flow of reality. Wu wei should be our way of life, because the dao always benefits, it does not harm (ch. 81) The way of heaven (dao of tian) is always on the side of good (ch. 79) and virtue (de) comes forth from the dao alone (ch. 21). What causes this natural embedding of good and benefit in the dao is vague and elusive (ch. 35), not even the sages understand it (ch. 76). But the world is a reality that is filled with spiritual force, just as a sacred image used in religious ritual might be (ch. 29). The dao occupies the place in reality that is analogous to the part of a family's house set aside for the altar for venerating the ancestors and gods (the ao of the house, ch. 62). When we think that life's occurrences seem unfair (a human discrimination), we should remember that heaven's (tian) net misses nothing, it leaves nothing undone (ch. 37)

A central theme of the Daodejing is that correlatives are the expressions of the movement of dao. Correlatives in Chinese philosophy are not opposites, mutually excluding each other. They represent the ebb and flow of the forces of reality: yin/yang, male/female; excess/defect; leading/following; active/passive. As one approaches the fullness of yin, yang begins to horizon and emerge. Its teachings on correlation often suggest to interpreters that the DDJ is filled with paradoxes. For example, ch. 22 says, "Those who are crooked will be perfected. Those who are bent will be straight. Those who are empty will be full." While these appear paradoxical, they are probably better understood as correlational in meaning. The DDJ says, "straightforward words seem paradoxical," implying, however, that they are not (ch. 78).

What is the image of the ideal person, the sage (sheng ren), the real person (zhen ren) in the DDJ? Well, sages wu wei (chs. 2, 63). In this respect, they are like newborn infants, who move naturally, without planning and reliance on the structures given to them by others (ch. 15). The DDJ tells us that sages empty themselves, becoming void of pretense. Sages concentrate their internal energies (qi). They clean their vision (ch. 10). They manifest plainness and become like uncarved wood (pu) (ch. 19). They live naturally and free from desires given by men (ch. 37) They settle themselves and know how to be content (ch. 46). The DDJ makes use of some very famous analogies to drive home its point. Sages know the value of emptiness as illustrated by how emptiness is used in a bowl, door, window, valley or canyon (ch. 11). They preserve the female (yin), meaning that they know how to be receptive and are not unbalanced favoring assertion and action (yang) (ch. 28). They shoulder yin and embrace yang, blend internal energies (qi) and thereby attain harmony (he) (ch. 42). Those following the dao do not strive, tamper, or seek control (ch. 64). They do not endeavor to help life along (ch. 55), or use their heart-mind (xin) to "solve" or "figure out" life's apparent knots and entanglements (ch. 55). Indeed, the DDJ cautions that those who would try to do something with the world will fail, they will actually ruin it (ch. 29). Sages do not engage in disputes and arguing, or try to prove their point (chs. 22, 81). They are pliable and supple, not rigid and resistive (chs. 76, 78). They are like water (ch. 8), finding their own place, overcoming the hard and strong by suppleness (ch. 36). Sages act with no expectation of reward (chs. 2, 51). They put themselves last and yet come first (ch. 7). They never make a display of themselves, (chs. 72, 22). They do not brag or boast, (chs. 22, 24) and they do not linger after their work is done (ch. 77). They leave no trace (ch. 27). Because they embody dao in practice, they have longevity (ch. 16). They create peace (ch. 32). Creatures do not harm them (chs. 50, 55). Soldiers do not kill them (ch. 50). Heaven (tian) protects the sage and the sage becomes invincible (ch. 67).

Among the most controversial of the teachings in the DDJ are those directly associated with rulers. Recent scholarship is moving toward a consensus that the persons who developed and collected the teachings of the DDJ played some role in civil administration, but they may also have been practitioners of ritual arts and what we would call religious rites. Be that as it may, many of the aphorisms directed toward rulers seem puzzling at first sight. According to the DDJ, the proper ruler keeps the people without knowledge, (ch. 65), fills their bellies, opens their hearts and empties them of desires (ch. 3). A sagely ruler reduces the size of the state and keeps the population small. Even though the ruler possesses weapons, they are not used (ch. 80). The ruler does not seek prominence. The ruler is a shadowy presence (chs. 17, 66). When the ruler's work is done, the people say they are content (ch. 17). This is all the more interesting when we remember that the philosopher and legalist political theorist named Han Feizi used the DDJ as a guide for the unification of China. Han Feizi was the foremost counselor of the first emperor of China, Qin Shihuangdi (r. 221-206 BCE). It is a pity that the emperor used the DDJ's admonitions to "fill the bellies and empty the minds" to justify his program of destroying all books not related to medicine, astronomy or agriculture.

4. The First Biography and the Establishment of Laozi as the Founder of Daoism

We have now arrived at the stage where studies of Lao Tan usually begin. The first known attempt to write a biography of Laozi is in the Shi ji (Records of the Historian, c. 90-104 BCE) by Sima Qian (145-89 BCE). According to this text, Laozi's surname was Li, and his personal name was Er. The narrative does not use the name Lao Tan, only Laozi. However, Qian reports that a historiographer named Tan did advise one of the Dukes of Qin, and that he indeed predicted the Zhou and Qin would split and a new empire would emerge. Then he says, "Some say Tan was Laozi, some say not. No one in our time knows whether or not it is so." (translations from Sima Qian done by A.C. Graham) In yet a further effort to narrow down the identification of Laozi, Qian mentions the Lao Laizi of the Zhuangzi and acknowledges that he came from the same state as Laozi, and that he authored a work of 15 sections on Daoist practice. Qian says Lao Laizi was a contemporary of Confucius, but clearly he seems to make a distinction between Lao Laizi and Laozi. Finally, there is the end of the biography in which Qian talks about Laozi's son's fortunes and ties them to the area from which the Han ruling family came.

Qian's biographical account follows the Zhuangzi in stating Laozi's occupation as an archivist for the state of Zhou. Like the Zhuangzi it also reports exchanges between Laozi and Confucius. Two dialogues are briefly reported. In one, Laozi tells Confucius to give up his stiff deportment and prideful airs. It is very similar to Zhuangzi Mixed Chapter 26. In the other passage, Confucius is reported to have praised Laozi's wisdom and to have compared him to a dragon in a way virtually identical to Zhuangzi Outer Chapter 14.

Sima Qian says, "Laozi cultivated the dao and its virtue." We recognize of course that "dao and its virtue" is Dao de, and that this is a reference to Laozi's association with the Daodejing. What the Zhuangzi only alluded to by putting near quotes from the DDJ in the mouth of Laozi, Sima Qian makes explicit. He tells us that when the Zhou kingdom began to decline, Laozi decided to leave China and head into the West. When he reached the mountain pass, the keeper of the pass (Yin Xi, also called Kuan-yin) insisted that he write down his teachings, so that the people would have them after he left. So, "Laozi wrote a book in two parts, discussing the ideas of the Way and of Virtue in some 5,000 words, and departed. No one knows where he ended his life."

A.C. Graham has made a study of Sima Qian's account and the other origins of the Lao Tan (Laozi) legend. Graham believes that the oldest stratum of the stories about Lao Tan is actually a Confucian tale relating how Confucius sought instruction in the rites from Lao Tan, who was known as an archivist of Zhou. Graham dates this part of the legend as far back as the 4th Cent. BCE. What we do not know is whether this account actually preserves some factual historical reminiscence, or simply an exemplary story designed to show that Confucius sought learning anywhere and was humbly willing to be taught by anyone. But then what happened was that Lao Tan was adopted in the "Inner Chapters" of the Zhuangzi (before 300 BCE) as a spokesmen for Zhuang Zhou's views and an instructor of Confucius.

The next stage in the development of Laozi's biography was the appearance of Laozi under the name Lao Tan, thereby appropriating the place Tan had occupied as a teacher of Confucius. We cannot be certain whether this identification of the two figures was actually done by Zhuang Zhou or was a later redaction of Inner Ch. 3. But certainly Lao Tan and Laozi are used interchangeably in Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven and Mixed Ch. 27, Imputed Words. From this point on, Laozi is offered as a figure representing a definite philosophical trend.

Another movement in the evolution of the Laozi story was completed by about 240 BCE. This was necessitated by Lao Tan's association with the grand historiographer Tan during the Zhou, who predicted the rise of the Qin state. This information, along with that of Laozi's journey to the West, and of the writing of the book for Yin Xi (Kuan-yin) won the favor for Laozi from the Qin. And the association of Laozi with a text (the DDJ) that was becoming increasingly significant was important. However, with the demise of the Qin state, some realignment of Laozi's connection with them was needed. So, Qian's final remarks about Laozi's son helped to associate the philosopher's lineage with the new Han ruling family. The journey to the West component now also had a new force. It explained why Laozi was not presently advising the Han rulers.

Sima Qian classified the Six Schools as Yin-Yang, Confucian, Mohist, Legalists, School of Names, and Daoists. Since his biography located Laozi earlier than Zhuangzi, and the passages in the Zhuangzi seemed to be about a person who lived before the text (and not to be simply a literary or traditional invention), then Laozi became established as the founder of the Daoist school.

5. The Laozi Myth

Livia Kohn has written a historical account of the development of the Laozi myth from the Han through the Six Dynasties period (200 BCE to 600 CE). In The Lives of the Immortals by Liu Xiang (Lie xuan zhuan, 77-6 BCE) there are separate entries for Laozi and Yin Xi (Kuan-yin). According to the story, Yin became a disciple and begged Laozi to allow him to go to the West as well. Laozi told him that he could come along, but only after he cultivated the dao. Laozi instructed Yin to study hard and await a summons which would be delivered to him in the marketplace in Chengdu. There is now a shrine at the putative location of this site dedicated to "ideal discipleship." More importantly, in this text it is clear that practitioners of immortality regarded Laozi as a superior daoshi (fangshi) who had achieved immortality through wisdom and the practice of techniques for longevity.

Emperor Huan (r. 147-167 CE) built a palace on the traditional site of Laozi's birthplace and authorized veneration and sacrifice to Laozi. The Laozi ming (Inscription on Laozi) written by Pien Shao in c. 166 CE as a commemorative marker for the site goes well beyond Sima Qian's biography. It makes the first apotheosis of Laozi into a deity. The text makes reference to the many cosmic metamorphoses of Laozi, allowing him portraying him as having been counselor to the great sage kings of China. The elite at the imperial court divinized Laozi and regarded him as an embodiment of the dao, a kind of cosmic emperor who knew how to rule things in perfect harmony and bring peace.

During the reign of Emperor Huidi of the Western Jin dynasty (290-306 CE), Wang Fu, a libationer of the Celestial Masters Tradition often debated with the Buddhist monk Bo Yuan about philosophical beliefs. The result was that Fu wrote a one volume work entitled Book of Laozi's Conversion of the Barbarians (laozi huahu jing) designed to put forward the view that Laozi went to India, changed into Buddha, and converted the barbarians. The basic thrust of the book was that Buddhism was a form of Daoism. Later, the work was gradually enlarged and adapted into ten volumes and it became a repository for Daoist polemic against Buddhism. Both Emperor Gaozong and Emperor Zhongzong of the Tang dynasty gave orders to prohibit its distribution. In the Yuan dynasty (1285 CE), Emperor Shizu ordered the burning of the Daoist canon of texts, and the first one destroyed was the Book of the Conversion of Barbarians.

The Daoist cosmological belief in the transformation of beings was greatly strengthened by the text Scripture on the Transformations of Laozi (The Laozi Bianhua Wuji Jing, late 100s CE). This work reflects some of the ideas in Pien Shao's inscription, but takes them much further. It tells how Laozi transformed into his own mother and gave birth to himself, taking quite literally comments in the DDJ where the dao is portrayed as the mother of all things. The work associates Laozi with the manifestations or incarnations of the dao itself. The final passage is an address given by Laozi predicting his reappearance and promising liberation from trouble and the overthrow of the Han dynasty! The millennial cults of the second century believed Laozi was a messianic figure who appeared to their leaders and gave them instructions and revelations.

The period of the Celestial Masters (c. 142-260 CE) produced documents enhancing the myth of Laozi. Laozi was now called Lao jun (Lord Lao) or Tai Shang Lao Jun (Lord Lao Most High). Lao jun could manifest himself in any time of unrest and bring great peace (tai ping). Yet, the Celestial Masters never claimed that Lao jun had done so in their day. Instead of such a direct manifestation, the Celestial Masters practitioners taught that Lao jun transmitted to them talismans, registers, and new scriptures in the form of texts.

Most later writings about Laozi continued to base their appeals to Laozi's authority on his ongoing transmigrations, but they give evidence of the growing tension between Daoism and Buddhism. The first mythological account of Laozi's birth is in the Scripture of the Inner Explanation of the Three Heavens, a Celestial Master work dated about 420 CE. In this text, Laozi has three births: as the manifestation of the dao from pure energy to become a deity in heaven; in human form as the ancient philosopher of the Daodejing; and as the Buddha after his journey to the West. In the first birth, his mother is known as The Jade Maiden of Mystery and Wonder. In his second, he is born to a human woman known as Mother Li. This was an eighty-one year pregnancy, after which he was born from her left armpit (there is a tradition that Buddha had been born from his mother's right arm pit). At birth he had white hair and so he was called laozi (Old Child). This birth is set in the time of the Shang dynasty, several centuries before the date Sima Qian reports. But the purpose of such a move is to allow him time to travel to the West and then become the Buddha. The third birth takes place in India as the Buddha. For details of this birth we turn to Esoteric Record of Mystery and Wonder, another fifth century document of the Celestial Masters. According to this text, Laozi entered into the body of the wife of the king of India through her mouth. Later he was born through her left arm pit. He walked immediately after his birth, and "from then on Buddhist teaching came to flourish." (quoted in Kohn)

Ge Hong's (283-343 CE) The Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity (Baopuzi neipian) is the most important Daoist philosophical work of that period. Ge Hong said that in a state of visualization he saw Laozi, seven feet tall, with cloudlike garments of five colors, wearing a multi-tiered cap and carrying a sharp sword. According to Ge, Laozi had a prominent nose, long eyebrows, and an elongated head. This physiological type was template for portraying immortals in Daoist art.

Authority for Celestial Masters practices and beliefs was usually backed up by some new account of Laozi. In the 500s CE the Scripture on Opening the Cosmos had Laozi teach the sage-king who developed agriculture about the grains, so that the people would not have to kill birds and beasts for food. And he taught another sage-king how to make fire.

The hagiography of Laozi has continued to develop, down to the present day. There are even traditions that various natural geographic landmarks and features are the enduring imprint of Lord Lao on China and his face can be seen in them. It is more likely, of course, that Laozi's immortality is in the mark made by the philosophical movement he has come to represent and the culture it created..

6. Select Bibliography

Ames, Roger. (1998). Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Bokenkamp, Stephen R. (1997). Early Daoist Scriptures. Berkeley: University of California Press.

Csikszentmihalyi, Mark and Ivanhoe, Philip J., eds. (1999). Religious and Philosophical Aspects of the Laozi. Albany: State University of New York.

Giles, Lionel. (1948). A Gallery of Chinese Immortals. London: John Murray.

Graham, Angus. (1981). Chuang tzu: The Inner Chapters. London: Allen & Unwin.

Graham, Angus. (1989). Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court.

Graham, Angus. [1998 (1986)], "The Origins of the Legend of Lao Tan." In Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching, ed. Kohn, Livia Kohn and Michael LaFargue, 23-41. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Hansen, Chad. (1992). A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought. New York: Oxford University Press.

Henricks, Robert. (1989). Lao-Tzu: Te-Tao Ching. New York: Ballantine.

Ivanhoe, Philip J. (2002). The Daodejing of Laozi. New York: Seven Bridges Press.

Kohn, Livia, (1998). "The Lao-Tzu Myth." In Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching, ed. Kohn, Livia Kohn and Michael LaFargue, 41-63. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Kohn, Livia, (1996). "Laozi: Ancient Philosopher, Master of Longevity, and Taoist God." In Religions of China in Practice, ed. Donald S. Lopez, 52-63. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Kohn, Livia and LaFargue, Michael. (1998). Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Kohn, Livia and Roth, Harold (2002) Daoist Identity: History, Lineage, and Ritual. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.

Watson, Burton. (1968). The Complete Works of Chuang Tzu. New York: Columbia University Press.

Welch, Holmes. (1966). Taoism: The Parting of the Way. Boston: Beacon Press.

Welch, Holmes and Seidel, Anna, eds. (1979). Facets of Taoism. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.

Pudgalavada Buddhist Philosophy

buddhaThe Pudgalavāda was a group of five of the Early Schools of Buddhism. The name arises from their adherents’ distinctive doctrine (vāda) concerning the self or person (pudgala). The doctrine holds that the person, in a certain sense, is real. To other Buddhists, their view seemed to contradict a fundamental tenet of Buddhism, the doctrine of non-self. However, the Pudgalavādins were convinced that they had had preserved the true interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching.

Although now all but forgotten, the Pudgalavāda was one of the dominant traditions of Buddhism in India during the time that Buddhism survived there. It was never strong in other parts of Asia, however, and with the eventual disappearance of Buddhism in India, almost all of the literature of the Pudgalavāda was lost. It is difficult to reconstruct their understanding of the self from the few Chinese translations that have come down to us, and from the summaries of their doctrines and the critiques of their position that have been preserved by other Buddhist schools. But there is no doubt that they affirmed the reality of the self or person, and that with scriptural authority they held that the self of an enlightened one cannot be described as non-existent after death, in “complete Nirvana” (Parinirvana), even though the five “aggregates” which are the basis of its identity have then passed away without any possibility of recurrence in a further life. These five are material form, feeling, ideation, mental forces, and consciousness.

It seems, then, that they thought of some aspect or dimension of the self as transcending the aggregates and may have identified that aspect with Nirvana, which like most early Buddhists they regarded as an eternal reality. In its involvement with the aggregates through successive lives, the self could be seen as characterized by incessant change; but in its eternal aspect, it could be seen as having an identity that remains constant through all its lives until it fulfils itself in the impersonal happiness of Parinirvana. Although their account of the self seemed unorthodox and irrational to their Buddhist opponents, the Pudgalavādins evidently believed that only such an account could do justice to the Buddha’s moral teaching, to the accepted facts of karma, rebirth and liberation, and to our actual experience of selves and persons.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Problem of the Self in Buddhism
  3. The Pudgalavādin Characterization of the Self
  4. Reconstruction of the Pudgalavādin Conception of the Self
  5. Pudgalavādin Arguments in Support of their Conception of the Self
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The Pudgalavāda was a group of five of the Early Schools of Buddhism, distinguished from the other schools by their doctrine of the reality of the self. The group consists of the Vātsīputrīya, the original Pudgalavādin School, and four others that derived from it, the Dharmottarīya, the Bhadrayānīya, the Sāmmitīya and the Shannagarika. Of these, only the Vātsīputrīya and the Sāmmitīya had a large following. The Vātsīputrīya evidently arose about two centuries after the death of the Buddha (the Parinirvana). Since the date of the Buddha’s death was probably in about 486 BCE or 368 BCE (according to which sources one follows), the rise of the Vātsīputrīya school would have been in the early third century or toward the middle of the second century BCE. According to the Chinese monk Xuanzang (Hsüan-tsang), who traveled in India in the seventh century CE, the Sāmmitīya was at that time by far the largest of the Shrāvakayāna schools (or Early Schools), equal in size to all of the other schools combined; and as the monastic populations of the Shrāvakayāna and the Mahāyāna were roughly the same, the Sāmmitīya represented about a quarter of the entire Buddhist monastic population of India. The Vātsīputrīya and a branch of the Sāmmitīya survived in India at least until the tenth century, but since the Pudgalavādin schools never spread to any great extent beyond the subcontinent, when Buddhism died out in India, the tradition of the Pudgalavāda came to an end.

The name Pudgalavāda came to be applied to these schools because “pudgala” was one of the words which they used for the self whose reality they affirmed. “Pudgala” is a term that appears in the early canonical texts with the meaning of a person or individual. The Pudgalavāda is thus a Doctrine of the Person, or Personalism, and Pudgalavādins are accordingly Personalists. Their use of the term “pudgala” has sometimes given the impression that they were trying to conceal their unorthodoxy by talking about a person rather than a self. But in fact they often used other words for the self, such as “ātman” and “jīva,” and were evidently quite unabashed in declaring that the self is real.

It is hardly necessary to point out the importance, both philosophically and historically, of a form of Buddhism which differs strikingly in its interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching from what we have come to regard as orthodox, and yet was for some time, at least, the dominant form of Shrāvakayāna Buddhism in India. But the difficulties facing us in investigating the Pudgalavāda are considerable. There is no living tradition of Pudgalavāda; there are no learned monks to whom we can turn for interpretations handed down within that tradition. There are very few Pudgalavādin texts that have survived, only two of them with anything to say about the self, and those only in Chinese translations of poor quality. Apart from these, we have extensive quotations from their texts (but none, unfortunately, dealing with the self) in an Indian Buddhist work which has survived only in Tibetan, some brief summaries of their doctrines in Tibetan and Chinese translations of Indian works on the formation of the Shrāvakayāna schools, and finally criticisms of their doctrines in works from other schools, some of these fortunately available in Pali or Sanskrit. The evidence we have is thus quite limited, much of it surviving only in translation, and some of it from hostile sources. Any interpretation of the Pudgalavādin doctrine of the self will necessarily be to a considerable extent a reconstruction, and should accordingly be regarded as a more or less plausible hypothesis rather than anything like a definitive account.

2. The Problem of the Self in Buddhism

The Buddha taught that no self is to be found either in or outside of the five skandhas or in their aggregates; the five are material form, feeling, ideation, mental forces, and consciousness. He rejected the two extreme positions of a permanent, unchanging self persisting in Samsara (cycle of death and rebirth) through successive lives, and of a self which is completely destroyed at death. He taught instead a middle position of dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda), according to which our existence in this life has arisen as a result of our ethically significant volitional acts (karma) in our last life, and such volitional acts in our present life will give rise to our existence (but will not determine our acts) in our next life. What we are now is thus not the same as what we were, since this is a new life with a different body, different feelings and so on, but neither is it entirely separate from what we were, since what we are now is the result of decisions made in our past life.

In the non-Pudgalavādin schools, which we now think of as orthodox in this regard, this teaching was interpreted (not unreasonably) as a denial that there is any substantial self together with an affirmation of the complex process of evanescent phenomena which at any particular time we identify as a person. In the opinion of these schools, the teaching understood in this way offers several advantages: first, it is true, in the sense that it can be accepted as an accurate account of what can actually be observed of a person (including the events and decisions of past lives, which were supposed to be accessible to the Buddha’s memory); secondly, it removes the basis for selfishness (the root of both wrong-doing and suffering) by exposing the ultimate unreality of the self as a substantial entity; and thirdly, it supports the view that what we do makes a real difference to what we become in both this life and future lives. It thus offers rational hope for an eventual dismantling of the otherwise self-perpetuating mechanism of misunderstanding, craving and suffering in which we are trapped.

But this interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching also involves certain difficulties. In the first place, even if we can understand the functional identity of the person as simply the continuity of a causal process in which the evanescent phenomena of the five aggregates occur and recur in a gradually changing pattern, it is hard to understand how this continuity is maintained through death to the birth of the person in a new life. If rebirth is immediate, as the Theravādins held, how can the final moments of one life bring about the beginning of a new life in a place necessarily at some distance from the place of death? But if there is an intermediate state between death and rebirth, as the Sarvāstivādins held, how can the person journey from one life to the next when the aggregates of the old life have passed away and the aggregates of the new life have not yet arisen? Or if there are aggregates in the intermediate state, why does this state not constitute a life interposed between the one that has ended and the one that is to begin?

In the second place, the denial of the ultimate reality of the self certainly seems to cut away the basis for selfishness, but it seems in the same way to cut away the basis for compassion. If the effort to gain anything for oneself is essentially deluded, how can it not be equally deluded to try to gain anything for other persons, other selves? If to be liberated is to realize that there was never anyone to be liberated, why would that liberation not include the realization that there was never anyone else to be liberated either? Yet it was out of compassion that the Buddha, freshly enlightened, undertook to teach in the first place, and without that compassion there would have been no Buddhism.

Schools that accepted this interpretation, such as the Theravāda and Sarvāstivāda, were of course aware of these difficulties and dealt with them as well as they could. But it is not surprising that the Pudgalavādin schools, sensitive to such problems, developed a fundamentally different interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching about the self.

3. The Pudgalavādin Characterization of the Self

The Pudgalavādins described the person or self as “inexpressible,” that is, as indeterminate in its relation to the five aggregates, since it cannot be identified with the aggregates and cannot be found apart from them: the self and the aggregates are neither the same nor different. But whereas other schools took this indeterminacy as evidence that the self is unreal, the Pudgalavādins understood it to characterize a real self, a self that is “true and ultimate.” It is this self, they maintained, that dies and is reborn through successive lives in Samsara, continuing to exist until enlightenment is attained. Even in Parinirvana, when the aggregates of the enlightened self have passed away in death and no new aggregates can arise in rebirth, the self, though no longer existent with the aggregates of an individual person, cannot actually be said to be non-existent.

Like most other Shrāvakayāna Buddhists, the Pudgalavādins regarded Nirvana as a real entity, differing from the realm of dependent origination (though not absolutely distinct from it) in being uncaused (asamskrita) and thus indestructible. Accordingly, Nirvana is not something brought into being at the moment of enlightenment, but is rather an eternally existing reality which at that moment is finally attained. The Pudgalavādins held that the self is indeterminate also in its relation to this eternal reality of Nirvana: the self and Nirvana are neither the same nor different.

In its indeterminate relationship with the five aggregates and Nirvana, the self is understood to constitute a fifth category of existence, the “inexpressible.” The phenomena of the five aggregates and of temporal existence in general form three categories: past phenomena, present phenomena and future phenomena. Nirvana, as an eternal, uncaused reality, is the fourth category. The self or person, not to be described either as the same as the dependent phenomena of the temporal world or as distinct from them, is the fifth.

The Pudgalavādins distinguished three ways in which the self can be designated or conceived:

  1. according to the aggregates appropriated as its basis in a particular life: In the this case, we have a conception of a particular person based on what we know of that person’s physical appearance, feelings, thoughts, inclinations and awareness.
  2. according to its acquisition of new aggregates in its transition from a past life to its present one, or from the present life to a future one: In this case, we would have a conception of a particular person as one who was such-and-such a person, with that person’s body, feelings and so on, in a previous life, or as one who will be reborn as such-and-such a person, with that person’s body, feelings and so on, in a future life.
  3. according to the final passing away of its aggregates at death after attaining enlightenment: In the this case, we have a conception of a person who has attained Parinirvana based on the body, feelings, thoughts, inclinations and awareness that have passed away at death without any possibility of recurrence.

In this way, all the statements made by the Buddha—and by others on his authority or on the strength of their own observation, concerning persons or selves and their past or future existences—can be shown to be based on the five aggregates from which those persons are inseparable.

Other schools understood the self to be a merely conceptual entity in the sense that it was simply the diverse phenomena of the five aggregates comprehended for convenience under a single term such as “self” or “person.” They supposed its existence to be thus purely nominal; there is no single, substantial entity corresponding to the term we use for it. We might expect that the Pudgalavādins, who held that the self is real, would on the contrary insist that the self is not merely conceptual or nominal, but substantial. But in fact they seem to have regarded the self, at lest initially, as conceptual, though “true and ultimate.” A later source represents them as maintaining that it is neither conceptual nor substantial, and still later sources ascribe the view to them that the self is indeed substantial. The difference in these accounts may be the result of confusion in our sources, but it is certainly possible that the Pudgalavādins gradually modified their position under the pressure of criticism from other schools.

The Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins made a clear distinction between what are traditionally called “two truths,” which in modern parlance is a distinction between two types of “truth predicates”: ultimate truth (paramārthasatya) and conventional truth (samvritisatya). Ultimate truth distinguishes accurate statements about primary phenomena (dharmas) and their relationships. Conventional truth distinguishes accurate statements about persons and other composite entities; they were thus statements expressed according to the conventions of ordinary usage, and are true only in the sense that they could in principle be translated into accurate statements about the constituent phenomena on which such conventional notions as “person” and so on were based. The two types of truth predicates (commonly called the “Two Truths”) are to be distinguished from four important principles taught by the Buddha, which are not truth predicates, but are called the “Four Noble Truths.” These “Truths” are: (1) life is suffering (the Truth of Suffering), (2) suffering arises from desire (the Truth of the Origination of Suffering), (3) suffering can be stopped (the Truth of Nirvana and the Cessation of Suffering), (4) the cessation of suffering is brought about by adherence to the Buddhist Path, which consists of prescriptions such as the Eight Fold Path (the Truth of the Path).

The Pudgalavādins also distinguished between two kinds of doctrine, concerning phenomena and concerning persons, but they did not regard these as related to higher and lower kinds of truth predicates. They actually recognized three truth predicates: “ultimate truth,, “characteristical truth,” and “practical truth.” They identified ultimate truth with the Third Noble Truth, the Truth of Nirvana, and the cessation of suffering. Characteristical truth distinguishes the First, Second and Fourth of the Noble Truths, the Truths of Suffering, its Origin, and the Path leading to its cessation. Because the characteristical truth predicate was understood as characterizing the world oriented of the Four Noble Truths, it was understood as also distinguishing accurate claims about dependent phenomena. The practical truth predicate distinguished forms of speech and behavior inherited through local or family traditions or learned through monastic training. It would seem that the self was subject to all three of these truths, as the one who eventually attains the cessation of suffering, as the one who suffers as a result of craving and follows a path leading to the end of suffering, and as the one who speaks and acts in accordance with the norms of secular or monastic life.

4. Reconstruction of the Pudgalavādin Conception of the Self

What the Pudgalavādins said (or in some cases are said to have said) about the self is sufficient to locate their conception of the self in relation to various Buddhist and non-Buddhist opinions that they rejected. But the exact nature of their conception of it remains unclear. Just what was the self supposed to be? Was it simply the five aggregates taken together as a totality but which was not reducible to its parts? Or was it a persisting entity distinct from the aggregates but bound to them so that it could be said to change as the aggregates connected with it changed? Or was it in fact something else altogether?

If the self was supposed to be conceptual, as the Pudgalavādins seem initially to have asserted, that would tend to support the view that they regarded the self as the totality of its constituent aggregates. This view differed from the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins in not thinking that this conceptual whole was reducible to its parts. On the other hand, if it was supposed to be substantial, as the Pudgalavādins seem later to have asserted, that would tend to support the view that they regarded it as an entity in its own right, non-different from the aggregates only in the sense that it was inseparably bound to them. But there is a problem that affects both of these interpretations. The person who has completely passed away in Parinirvana is supposed to be neither existent nor non-existent. If the self were the aggregates taken as a whole, then with the final destruction of body, feeling, and so on the self would simply be non-existent. But if the self were an entity distinct from the aggregates though bound to them, then in Parinirvana the self would either come to an end together with the aggregates and thus be non-existent, or else it would continue to exist without the aggregates, in spite of allegedly being bound to them, and so would be simply existent. The former interpretation in fact comes too close to identifying the self with the aggregates, and the latter, to treating it as a separate entity.

An analogy that the Pudgalavādins frequently made use of may give some indication of what they actually had in mind. They say that the person is to the aggregates as fire is to its fuel. This analogy appears in a number of the canonical texts and so would have to be accepted by all Buddhist who accepted these texts, though their understanding of it would of course be different from the Pudgalavādins’. As the Pudgalavādins explain it, fire is described in terms of its fuel, as a wood fire or a straw fire, but the fire is not the same as the fuel, nor can it continue to burn without the fuel. Similarly, the person is described in terms of the aggregates, as having such-and-such a physical appearance and so on, but it is not the same as that particular body, those feelings and so on, and cannot exist without a body, feelings and the other aggregates. This analogy makes it clear that although the aggregates in some sense support the self, they are not actually its constituents, since a fire, though supported by its fuel, is certainly not a whole constituted by some particular arrangement of logs.

What the analogy seems not to make clear is why the person in Parinirvana, no longer supported by the aggregates, is not simply non-existent like a fire that has gone out when its fuel is exhausted. But there is reason to think that the Pudgalavādins did not understand the extinction of the fire as we would. Several of the canonical texts that use this analogy specifically compare the Buddha after death to a fire that has gone out and has not gone north, south, east or west, but is simply extinct; but instead of going on to say that the Buddha is non-existent, they say that he is “unfathomable”, that he cannot be described in terms of arising or non-arising, existence or non-existence. Another text, preserved and accepted as authoritative by the Theravādins, explains that Nirvana exists eternally and can be attained even though there is no place where it is “stored up,” just as fire exists and can be produced by rubbing two sticks together even though there is no place where it is stored up. The extinction of the fire can be understood as a transition from its local existence supported by its fuel to a non-local state which cannot be described as either existence or non-existence. The Parinirvana of the Buddha will then be his transition from a local existence supported by the aggregates to a non-local state which is unfathomable. A canonical text of the Mahāyāna explicitly describes the non-local form of the Buddha after his death as his “eternal body,” which is said to be like the fire that has not gone north, south, east or west, but is simply extinct.

There is no evidence that the Pudgalavādins anticipated this Mahāyāna doctrine of an eternal body of the Buddha. However, the analogy understood in this way certainly indicates that the person or self (in this case, the Buddha) is a local manifestation of something. Could that “something” have been a supreme self such as we find in the Upanishads and the Vedānta, and, suitably qualified, in some Mahāyāna texts? There is no evidence to suggest that it was, and in fact the Pudgalavādins may have felt that it would be inappropriate to use the term designating a local, dependent manifestation of that something to refer to the something itself, which unlike any self was eternal and independent of the aggregates.

But there is some evidence which points in another direction. One of our Pudgalavādin sources speaks of the person in Parinirvana as having attained the “unshakeable happiness”, and another source says that the Pudgalavādins held that although Nirvana has the nature of non-existence, because there is no body, faculty or thought there, it also has the nature of existence, because the supreme, ever-lasting happiness is there. So Nirvana is characterized by eternal happiness, but it is a happiness unaccompanied by any body, faculty or thought. Moreover, another source ascribes to the Pudgalavādins the view that Nirvana is the quiescence of the person’s previous “coming and going” in Samsara; it seems to say, then, that Nirvana is a state that the person achieves. This “state” cannot be something that comes into being when Nirvana is attained; otherwise Nirvana would be dependent and so in principle impermanent. And in Parinirvana there are no aggregates, and thus no person, in any normal sense, of which this quiescence could be a state. But if this quiescence is Nirvana, it cannot be simply the non-existence of the person, since we are told explicitly that the person is not nonexistent in Parinirvana (though of course not existent, either). Nirvana must be quiescence in the sense in which it is the “cessation of suffering,” not as a state that arises at the moment of enlightenment and is completed at death, but as an already existing reality whose attainment puts an end to suffering and the coming and going of Samsara.

But in what sense is this eternal happiness “attained” by the person who at death ceases to exist as a self supported by body, faculties and thought? And in what sense is a person who has attained this eternal happiness “not non-existent” after death, even though the five aggregates have passed away once and for all? If even without the aggregates the person somehow survives to enjoy the eternal happiness, why do the Pudgalavādins deny that the person is existent in Parinirvana? But if the person does not survive and there is supposed to be only eternal happiness without anyone who enjoys it, in what sense does the person attain it?

The difficulty arises from the assumption that the self or person and Nirvana are two different things, the one impermanent and the other eternal. But the Pudgalavādins say that the self and Nirvana are neither the same nor different. Even while suffering in Samsara the self is not distinct from the eternal happiness of Nirvana, and when the person’s body, feelings and so on have passed away in Parinirvana, the self is still not entirely non-existent. That is because Nirvana, which is not distinct from the self, continues to exist. The relationship between the self and Nirvana, then, seems to be similar to that between the local manifestation of fire and the fire in its non-local state. The “something” that is locally manifested as a self on the basis of the aggregates would thus be Nirvana.

5. Pudgalavādin Arguments in Support of their Conception of the Self

The Pudgalavādins, like other Buddhist philosophers, saw it as their task to present what they believed to be the best interpretation of the teaching of the Buddha and to support that interpretation through rational argument. The correctness of the Buddha’s teaching was beyond question; what could be debated was the adequacy of this or that interpretation as an explanation of his meaning. Accordingly, their arguments were broadly of two kinds: appeals to the canonical texts (sutras) in which the Buddha’s teaching had been preserved, and arguments on the basis of consistency with acknowledged fact. These were not entirely distinct, since the Buddha’s teaching was supposed to be based not on divine revelation but on the exercise of human faculties developed to an extraordinary degree, and “acknowledged fact” was understood to include generally accepted Buddhist doctrines concerning, for example, karma and rebirth.

Appeals to the canonical texts were not entirely straightforward. These texts had been transmitted orally for several centuries before being committed to writing. Each school preserved its own versions of these texts, and although the versions agreed to a considerable extent, there were also differences, in some cases involving whole sutras. It was not enough, then, for the Pudgalavādins and their opponents to quote sutras from their own versions of the canon; they had to make sure that the sutra they quoted was also included in their opponents’ version. Otherwise, their opponents would feel free to dismiss it as quite possibly a forgery.

The Pudgalavādins often quoted passages in which the Buddha spoke of persons or the self as existing. In most cases, these could be readily explained by their opponents on the basis of the two truths: the Buddha spoke conventionally of persons and the self, but elsewhere made it clear that ultimately there are only the phenomena of the five aggregates. In the view of such non-Pudgalavādin schools as the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins, these passages merely serve to explain how the Pudgalavādins have come to misunderstand the Buddha’s teaching; they give no support at all to the misinterpretation.

But there is one case at least in which the Buddha’s way of expressing himself is more difficult to account for, and the Theravādin and Sarvastivādin explanations of it show signs of strain. Here the Buddha speaks of the five aggregates as the burden, and identifies the bearer of the burden as the person. Certainly it is possible to explain this in terms, for example, of decisions made by the aggregates of a past life whose consequences are then a burden to the aggregates of this life. But the more natural and obvious reading is to take it as distinguishing between the person who transmigrates from life to life, and the aggregates which the person takes up with each life and carries as a burden.

In another passage to which the Pudgalavādins referred, the Buddha indicates that the idea that one has no self is a mistake. Their opponents were quick to point out that in the same passage he also indicates that the idea that one has a self is a mistake; the meaning, they would suggest, is that it is a mistake to affirm the ultimate existence of the self, but a mistake also to deny its conventional existence. This is certainly not unreasonable; but neither is the Pudgalavādins’ explanation: that it is a mistake to affirm the existence of a self that is either the same as the aggregates or separate from them (these being the two ways in which the self is usually imagined). but a mistake also to deny that there is any self at all.

The fact that the Buddha seems to have been generally unwilling to say outright that the self does not exist is something of an embarrassment for the Pudgalavādins’ opponents. The Buddha characteristically said that the self is not to be found in the aggregates or apart from them. The Theravādins, Sarvāstivādins and others take this to mean that there is no self at all (except nominally or conventionally); but the Pudgalavādins take it as characterizing an existing self which is neither the aggregates themselves nor something apart from them. Whenever the Buddha says that the aggregates in particular or phenomena (dharmas) in general are non-self, the Pudgalavādins understand this only as a denial that the self can be simply identified with them. The view of the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins, that what we call the self is simply the ever-changing aggregates spoken and thought of for convenience as a persisting entity, seems to the Pudgalavādins to be equivalent to identifying the self with its aggregates, a view which the Buddha explicitly rejected.

Apart from appeals to the canonical texts, the Pudgalavādins also offered arguments pointing out what they saw as the inadequacy of their opponents’ view to account for some of the facts of personal existence and self-cultivation which were generally accepted by Buddhists. They argued, for example, that if there were no person distinguishable from the aggregates, there would be no real basis for identifying oneself, as the Buddha did, with the person that one was in a previous life, since the aggregates in the two lives would be completely different. They evidently felt that the causal relationship that was supposed to obtain between the aggregates of a past life and those of the present life was insufficient to establish a personal identity persisting through the successive lives.

They also argued that one of the meditations recommended by the Buddha, in which the meditator cultivates the wish that all sentient beings may be happy, presupposes the existence of real sentient beings, of persons, to be the objects of the meditator’s benevolence. They rejected their opponents’ opinion that the aggregates are the real object of benevolence, and insisted that if that were the case, the Buddha’s recommendation to wish that all sentient beings may be happy would not have been “well said”. In their opponents’ view, this was simply another case in which the Pudgalavādins failed to recognize that the Buddha spoke conventionally of sentient beings and persons when it would have been inconvenient to speak in terms of the aggregates, which were all that was ultimately there. But to the Pudgalavādins it seemed clear that benevolence toward a sentient being or person is not the same thing as benevolence (if it is possible at all) toward a series of constantly changing aggregates.

They argued also that the operation of karma is incomprehensible if the person is nothing more than an assemblage of phenomena. Destroying a particular arrangement of particles of clay in the form of an ox is not killing anything and has in itself no karmic consequences; but destroying a particular arrangement of aggregates in the form of a living ox is killing something and has unfortunate consequences for the person who killed it. If the ox is really nothing but an arrangement of aggregates, destroying that arrangement, rearranging the aggregates, should have no more moral and karmic significance than smashing the clay image of an ox. Their thought seems to have been something like this: the phenomena (dharmas) which are supposed to be the ox’s constituents cannot, strictly speaking, be destroyed, since their existence is in any case momentary; all that can be destroyed is the arrangement in which these phenomena have been occurring, and that, in the view of their opponents, is nothing real. As Buddhists, their opponents agree with the Pudgalavādins in accepting the effectiveness of karma, but their denial of the reality of the self makes nonsense of what they accept.

The analogy with fire was important in explaining the indeterminacy of the self or person in relation to the aggregates, but they did not offer it as an argument in its own right for the reality of the self. Its function was rather to clarify the nature of the relationship between the self and the aggregates, and to serve as evidence that at least one instance of such a relationship could be recognized in the world around us, so that there could be no justification for rejecting their position out of hand as manifestly impossible.

6. Conclusion

The view of the Pudgalavādins, that the self is a real entity which is neither the same as the aggregates nor different from them, is certainly paradoxical and seems to have been regarded by their opponents as fundamentally irrational. But they evidently felt that only such a view did justice to our actual experience of personal existence and to what in the Buddhist tradition were the accepted facts of karma, rebirth and final liberation. To some extent they were able to explain the paradox by pointing to the ways in which the self seems limited to a particular body, particular feelings and so on and the ways in which it also seems to transcend these, but the self in their view remains something mysterious and only partially amenable to the principles of rational thought.

The Theravādins, Sarvāstivādins and others naturally saw the Pudgalavādins’ account of the self as not so much paradoxical as incoherent. They were sure that the reason that the Pudgalavādins could not really make sense of the self they affirmed was that no such self is possible. But there was after all some justification for the Pudgalavādins’ view, that their opponents, if they achieved consistency, did so to some extent at the expense of the facts. And the insistence of the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins on the precise determinacy of anything that they were prepared to regard as real brought its own problems, as the dialectic of the Mādhyamikas would show.

The very considerable success of the Pudgalavādins in India surely indicates that there were many who regarded their doctrine as a viable interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching. At the very least, it was an interpretation which, though different from what we now regard as orthodox, had significant strengths as well as weaknesses. Perhaps belief in a real though indeterminate self would tend, as their opponents argued, to reinforce our inveterate selfishness; but the Pudgalavādins held that the self once realized to be indeterminate could not be a basis for the self-love and craving that are the source of suffering. Their conception of a persisting self, moreover, could be felt to give a stronger sense of our investment in the person that we are to become, and thus a greater appreciation of the significance of our actions in this life. Finally, belief in the reality of other selves would seem to make it more difficult to ignore the suffering of others than if all persons were thought to be essentially an illusion. That there was in fact a danger that belief in the unreality of the self might lead to an attitude of indifference to other sentient beings is evident from the endless admonishments to cultivate compassion that we find in the works of the Mahāyāna.

As a theory of the self, the Pudgalavāda was naturally shaped and so in some measure limited by the concerns of Buddhism; the Pudgalavādins were interested in the nature of selfhood only to the extent that it had a bearing on the problem of suffering. But their interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching offers a perspective which is also of more general interest. Even in the fragmentary evidence that has come down to us, we can see at least the rough outline of a view which gives full weight to the instinctive conviction that as persons we are neither reducible to our apparent constituents, whether these are conceived to be dharmas or molecules, nor separable from our particular, concrete presence in the physical world. It is a view that reminds us of the experiential immediacy of our awareness of other selves, and that confirms our natural resistance to regarding a person as nothing more than a construct of the understanding. Finally, it renews in us the sense of something mysterious and perhaps ultimately unfathomable in the mere fact of our selfhood and of our existence in the world as conscious beings.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Aung, Shwe Zan and C.A.F. Rhys Davids. Points of Controversy. (English translation of the Kathāvatthu. ) London: Pali Text Society, 1915. Reprinted 1960.
  • Bareau, André. “Trois traités sur les sectes bouddhiques attribués à Vasumitra, Bhavya et Vinītadeva.” Journal Asiatique, 242 (1954), 229–66; 244 (1956), 167–200.
  • Bareau, André. Les sectes bouddhiques du petit véhicule. Paris: École Française d’ Extrême-Orient, 1955.
  • Conze, Edward. Buddhist Thought in India. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1962. Reprinted 1967, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
  • Demiéville, Paul. “L’origine des sectes bouddhiques d’après Paramartha.” Mélanges chinois et bouddhiques, 1 (1932),15–64. Reprinted 1973 in Choix d’études bouddhiques (1928–1970), Leiden: E.J. Brill, 80–130.
  • Dube, S.N. Cross Currents in Early Buddhism. New Delhi: Manohar, 1980.
  • Duerlinger, James. Indian Buddhist Theories of Persons: Vasubandhu’s “Refutation of the Theory of a Self”. London, New York: Routledge Curzon, 2003.
  • Dutt, Nalinaksha. Buddhist Sects in India. Calcutta: K.L. Mukhopadhyay, 1970.
  • Hurvitz, Leon. “The Road to Buddhist Salvation as Described by Vasubhadra.” (Includes a translation of part of the Siehanmu chaojie, Kumarabuddhi’s Chinese translation of the Tridharmakhandaka.) Journal of the American Oriental Society, 87.4 (1967), 434–86.
  • Jha, Ganganatha. The Tattvasamgraha of Sāntaraksita with the Commentary of Kamalasīla. (English translation of Shāntarakshita’sTattvasamgraha..) Baroda: Oriental Institute, 1937.
  • La Vallée Poussin, Louis de. L’Abhidharmakosa de Vasubandhu. (French translation from Xuanzang’s Chinese version of Vasubandhu’s Abhidharmakoshabhāshya.) Mélanges chinoises et bouddhiques, 16 (1923–31). Reprinted 1971.
  • La Vallée Poussin, Louis de. “La controverse du temps et du pudgala dans le Vijnānakāya.” (French translation of the first chapter of Xuanzang’s Chinese version of Devasharman’s Vijnānakāya.) Études Asiatiques, 20 (1923), 343–76.
  • Law, B.C. The Debates Commentary. (English translation of the Kathāvatthuppakarana-atthakathā.) London: Pali Text Society, 1940. Reprinted 1969.
  • Masuda, Jiryo. “Origin and Doctrines of Early Indian Buddhist Schools: a translation of the Hsüan-chwang version of Vasumitra’s treatise.” Asia Major, 2 (1925), 1–78.
  • Priestley, Leonard C.D.C. Pudgalavāda Buddhism: The Reality of the Indeterminate Self. Toronto: Centre for South Asian Studies, University of Toronto, 1999.
  • Sastri, N. Aiyaswami. Satyasiddhi of Harivarman, Vol. II. (English translation of Kumārajīva’s Chinese version of Harivarman’s Tattvasiddhi or Satyasiddhi.) Baroda: Oriental Institute, 1978.
  • Schayer, S. “Kamalasīlas Kritik des Pudgalavāda.” Rocnik Orientalistyczny, 10 (1934), 68–93.
  • Skilling, Peter. “History and Tenets of the Sāmmatīya School.” Linh-SonPublications d’études bouddhiques, 19 (1982), 38–52.
  • Skilling, Peter. “The Samskrtāsamskrta-Viniscaya of Dasabalasrīmitra.” Buddhist Studies Review, 4.1 (1987), 3–23.
  • Stcherbatsky, T. Soul Theory of the Buddhists. (Includes an English translation from the Tibetan of the ninth chapter of Vasubandhu’s Abhidharmakoshabhāshya, the “Pudgalavinishcaya”.) Bulletin de l’Academie des Sciences de Russie, 1919: 823–54, 937–58. Reprinted 1970, Varanasi: Bharatiya Vidya Prakasan.
  • Thich Thien Chau, Bhikshu. The Literature of the Personalists of Early Buddhism. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1999. English translation by Sara Boin-Webb of Les Sectes personnalistes (Pudgalavâdin) du bouddhisme ancien, Thèse pour le Doctorat d’ État ès-Lettres et Sciences humaines, Université de la Sorbonne Nouvelle (Paris III), 1977.
  • Venkataramanan, K. “Sāmmitīyanikāya Sāstra.” (English translation of the Sāmmitīyanikāyashāstra..) Visva-Bharati Annals, 5 (1953), 155–243.
  • Walleser, Max. Die Sekten des alten Buddhismus. (Die buddhistische Philosophie in ihrer geschichtlichen Entwicklung, Part 4.) Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1927.

Author Information

Leonard Priestley
University of Toronto

Hindu Philosophy

hindu2The compound “Hindu philosophy” is ambiguous. Minimally it stands for a tradition of Indian philosophical thinking. However, it could be interpreted as designating one comprehensive philosophical doctrine, shared by all Hindu thinkers. The term “Hindu philosophy” is often used loosely in this philosophical or doctrinal sense, but this usage is misleading. There is no single, comprehensive philosophical doctrine shared by all Hindus that distinguishes their view from contrary philosophical views associated with other Indian religious movements such as Buddhism or Jainism on issues of epistemology, metaphysics, logic, ethics or cosmology. Hence, historians of Indian philosophy typically understand the term “Hindu philosophy” as standing for the collection of philosophical views that share a textual connection to certain core Hindu religious texts (the Vedas), and they do not identify “Hindu philosophy” with a particular comprehensive philosophical doctrine.

Hindu philosophy, thus understood, not only includes the philosophical doctrines present in Hindu texts of primary and secondary religious importance, but also the systematic philosophies of the Hindu schools: Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta. In total, Hindu philosophy has made a sizable contribution to the history of Indian philosophy and its role has been far from static: Hindu philosophy was influenced by Buddhist and Jain philosophies, and in turn Hindu philosophy influenced Buddhist philosophy in India in its later stages. In recent times, Hindu philosophy evolved into what some scholars call "Neo-Hinduism," which can be understood as an Indian response to the perceived sectarianism and scientism of the West. Hindu philosophy thus has a long history, stretching back from the second millennia B.C.E. to the present.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Defining Hinduism: Salient Features and False Starts
      1. Karma
      2. Polytheism
      3. Purushārthas: dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa
      4. Varna (Caste)
    2. A Textual Definition of Hinduism and Hindu Philosophy
  2. Stage One: Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy: The Religious Texts
    1. The Four Vedas
      1. Karma Khaṇḍa or Action Section of the Vedas
      2. Jñana Khaṇḍa or Knowledge Section of the Vedas
    2. Secondary Texts: Smṛti Literature
      1. Itihāsas
      2. Bhagavad Gītā
      3. Purāṇas
      4. Dharmaśāstra
  3. Stage Two: Systematic Hindu Philosophy: the Darśanas
    1. Nyāya
    2. Vaiśeṣika
    3. Sāṅkhya
    4. Yoga
    5. Pūrvamīmāṃsā
    6. Vedānta
      1. Bhedābheda
      2. Commonalities of the Three Famous Commentaries
      3. Advaita
      4. Viśiṣṭādvaita
      5. Dvaita
    7. Classical Hindu Philosophy in the Context of Indian Philosophy
  4. Stage Three: Neo-Hinduism
  5. Conclusion: the Status of Hindu Philosophy
  6. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

“Hinduism” is a term used to designate a body of religious and philosophical beliefs indigenous to the Indian subcontinent. Hinduism is one of the world’s oldest religious traditions, and it is founded upon what is often regarded as the oldest surviving text of humanity: the Vedas. It is a religion practiced the world over. Countries with Hindu majorities include Bali, India, Mauritius and Nepal, though countries in Asia, Africa, Europe and the Americas have sizable minorities of practicing Hindus.

For historical and doctrinal reasons, some modern Indologists have adopted the convention of distinguishing between traditional Hinduism and “Neo-Hinduism” (cf. Hacker; Halbfass, India and Europe). Against this distinction, “Hinduism” is often reserved for some traditional philosophical and religious beliefs indigenous to the Indian subcontinent, and “Neo-Hinduism” is reserved for a modern set of religious and philosophical beliefs articulated by Indians who defined their religious views in contrast to a perceived Western preoccupation with scientism and sectarianism. For many Western educated individuals in the world today (particularly those who count themselves as “Hindus”), the philosophy captured under the term “Neo-Hinduism” designates their religious and philosophical belief set. While Neo-Hinduism is no doubt a part of the Hindu philosophical tradition, it constitutes a distinct development within the tradition. Here the terms “Neo-Hindu” and “Neo-Hinduism” will be used to single out this recent development of Hindu thought. “Hindu” and “Hinduism” will be used to designate any portion of the tradition. The label “Hindu philosophy” will be reserved for the philosophical elements of Hinduism.

The history of Hindu philosophy can be divided roughly into three, largely overlapping stages:

  1. Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy, found in the Vedas and secondary religious texts (beginning in the 2nd millennia B.C.E.)
  2. Systematic Hindu Philosophy (beginning in the 1st millennia B.C.E.)
  3. Neo-Hindu Philosophy (beginning in the 19th century C.E.)

Hindu philosophy is difficult to narrow down to a definite doctrine because Hinduism itself, as a religion, resists identification with any well worked out doctrine. This may not be so surprising when we consider that the term “Hinduism” itself is not in traditional, pre-colonial Hindu literature. Prior to the modern period of history, authors that we think of as Hindus did not identify themselves by that title. The term itself is not rooted in any Indian language, but likely derives from the Persian term “sindhu,” cognate with the Latin “Indus,” used to refer to inhabitants of the Indian subcontinent (cf. Monier-Williams p.1298). Its historical usage is thus an umbrella term that identifies many related religious and philosophical traditions that are not clearly part of another Indian tradition, such as Buddhism and Jainism.

Owing to the geographical proximity of the views grouped under the term “Hinduism” we might expect that such views have some comprehensive doctrinal similarities. However, many of the ideas and practices commonly associated with Hinduism can be found in adjacent Indian religio-philosophical traditions, such as Buddhism and Jainism. Moreover, some of them are not common to all Hindu thinkers. The rich diversity of views within the Hindu tradition that overlap with non-Hindu views makes identifying “Hinduism” on the basis of a shared, comprehensive doctrine difficult if not impossible.

a. Defining Hinduism: Salient Features and False Starts

i. Karma

A common thesis associated with Hinduism is the view that events in a person’s life are determined by karma. The term literally means “action,” but in this context it denotes the moral, psychological spiritual and physical causal consequences of morally significant past choices. If it were the case that a belief in karma is common to all Hindu philosophies, and only Hindu philosophies, then we would have a clear doctrinal criterion for identifying Hinduism. This approach is unsuccessful because a belief in karma is common to many of India’s religious traditions—including Buddhism and Jainism. Moreover, it is not evident that it is embraced by all sources that we consider Hindu. For instance, the doctrine of karma seems to be absent from much of the Vedas. Karma is not a sufficient criterion of Hinduism, and it likely is not a necessary condition either.

ii. Polytheism

Polytheism, or the worship of many deities, is often identified as a distinctive feature of Hinduism. However, it is not true that all Hindus are polytheists. Indeed, many Hindus belong to sectarian traditions (such as Vaiṣṇavism, or Śaivism) that specify that only one deity (Viṣṇu, in the first case, or Śiva, in the second), or a very small set of deities, are genuine Gods, and subordinate the rest of the pantheon associated with Hinduism to the status of exalted beings. We could identify Hinduism as the set of religious views that recognize the divinity or exalted status of a core set of Indic deities, but this too would not provide a way to separate Hinduism from Buddhism and Jainism. Many “Hindu” deities, such as Brahmā (the Creator God), are recognized and treated as exalted beings and deities in the Buddhist Pāli Canon (cf. Majjhima Nikāya II.130; Saṃyutta Nikāya I.421-23). Likewise, the popular Hindu deity Kṛṣṇa is treated in the early Jain tradition as a Jain Ford Maker, and a tradition of worshiping the Goddess Lakṣmī (a goddess revered by Hindus as the consort of Viṣṇu) continues amongst Jains today (see Dundas pp. 98, 183). Belief in certain deities might constitute a necessary condition of Hinduism, but it is not a sufficient criterion.

iii. Puruṣārthas : dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa

Hinduism might be identified with a core set of values, commonly known in Hindu literature as the puruṣārthas , or ends of persons. The puruṣārthas are a set of four values: dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa. “Dharma” in the Puruṣārtha scheme and throughout much of Hindu literature stands for the ethical or moral (in action, or in character, hence it is often translated as “duty”), “artha” for economic wealth, “kāma” for pleasure, and “mokṣa” for soteriological liberation from rebirth and imperfection. Hinduism, one might argue, is any religious view from the Indian subcontinent that recognizes that human beings ought to maximize the puruṣārthas at the appropriate time and in the appropriate ways. This approach will not do, for not all views that we consider Hindu recognize the validity of all of these values. While many of the systematic Hindu philosophical schools seem to be critical of kāma, understood as sensual pleasure, the early stage of one Hindu philosophical school—Pūrvamīmāṃsā—does not recognize the idea that there is anything like liberation as a possible end for individuals.

The puruṣārthas are important for any study of Indian thought, however, for they constitute the value-theoretic backdrop against which Indian thinkers articulated their views: typically, most all Indian philosophers recognized the validity of all four values, though some, like the Materialists (Cārvāka) are on record as holding that kāma or sensual pleasure is the only dharma or morality (Guṇaratna p.276), and that there is no such thing as liberation. Others such as the early Pūrvamīmāṃsā ignore the idea of personal liberation but emphasizes the importance of dharma. As all Hindu philosophical schools appear to recognize something that might count as “dharma” or morality, we might attempt to understand Hinduism in terms of its allegiance to a particular moral theory. This attempt to define Hinduism in terms of a simple doctrine fails, for some of what passes for dharma (ethics, morality or duty) in the context of particular schools of Hindu philosophical thought share much with non-Hindu, but Indian schools of thought. This is particularly apparent in the case of the Hindu philosophical school of Yoga, whose moral theory shares much with Jainism, and with Buddhist Mahāyāna thought. Also, there is sufficient variation amongst the schools of Hindu philosophy on moral matters that makes defining Hindu philosophy solely on the basis of a shared moral doctrine impossible. If there is a core moral theory common to all Hindu schools, it is likely to be so thin that it will also be found as a component of other Indian religions. Thus, an ethical theory might be a necessary criterion of Hinduism, but it is insufficient.

iv. Varna (Caste)

Finally, one might attempt to identify Hinduism with the institution of a caste system that carves society into a specified set of classes whose natures dispose them and obligate them to certain occupations in life. More specifically, one might argue that Hinduism is any belief system wedded to the idea that any well ordered society is composed of four castes: Brahmins (priestly or scholarly caste), Kṣatriya (marshal or royal caste), Vaiśyas (merchant caste) and Sūdras (labor caste).
This approach to defining Hinduism is essentially a rehabilitation of the idea that some core moral doctrine cements Hinduism together. There are two problems with this approach that renders it unhelpful to identifying Hinduism. First, anyone familiar with Indian society will know that caste (“varna,” or more commonly “jāti”) is an Indian phenomenon that is not restricted to Hindu sections of society. One might argue that the approving use of the term “Brahmin” in Buddhist and Jain texts shows that even these socially critical movements were comfortable with a caste structured society provided that obligations and privileges accorded to the various castes were justly distributed (cf. Dhammapada ch. XXVI; cf. Sūtrakṛtānga I.xii.11-21). Secondly, and more importantly, it is not clear that caste is philosophically important to many schools that are conventionally understood under the heading of “Hindu philosophy.” Some schools, such as Yoga, appear to be implicitly critical of life in conventional society guided by the values of social and ecological domination, while some schools, such as Advaita Vedānta, are openly critical of the idea that caste morality has any relevance to a spiritually serious aspirant.

b. A Textual Definition of Hinduism and Hindu Philosophy

Because the term “Hinduism” has no roots in the self-conceptualization of people that we in retrospect label as “Hindus,” we are unlikely to find anything very significant in the way of philosophical doctrine that is essential to Hinduism. Yet, the term continues to be useful because it centers on a stance that separates Hindu thinkers from Buddhist, Jain, or Sikh thinkers. The stance in question is openness to the provisional validity of a core set of Hindu texts. At the center of the canon of Hindu texts is the Vedas, followed by a large body of literature of secondary religious importance, which largely derive their legitimacy from Vedic thought. Non-systematic Hindu philosophy is comprised of the philosophical elements of the primary and secondary bodies of canonical Hindu texts, while the systematic Hindu philosophies, which also adopt the congenial disposition towards the Vedas, find their definitive expressions in formal philosophical texts authored by professional philosophers. Finally, Neo-Hindu philosophy of late likewise adopts a positive disposition to the Vedas, and hence constitutes the latest offering in the history of Hindu philosophy.

2. Stage One: Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy: The Religious Texts

a. The Four Vedas

The Vedas are a large corpus, originally committed to memory and transmitted orally from teacher to student. The term “veda” means "knowledge" or "wisdom" and embodies what was likely regarded by its original attendants as the sum-total of the knowledge of their people. On the basis of linguistic variations in the corpus, contemporary scholars are of the opinion that the Vedas were composed at various points during approximately a 900 year span that can be no later than 1500 B.C.E. to 600 B.C.E.. The Vedas are composed in an Indo-European language that is loosely referred to as Sanskrit, but much of it is in an ancient precursor to Sanskrit, more properly called Vedic.

The Vedic corpus is comprised of four works each called “Vedas.” The four Vedas are Ṛg Veda, Sāma Veda, Yajur Veda and Atharva Veda, respectively. Each of the four Vedas is edited into four distinct sections: Mantras, Brāhmanas, Āraṇyakas, and Upaniṣads.

i. Karma Khaṇḍa or Action Section of the Vedas

The main portion of the Veda (which the term “Veda” most properly refers to) consists of mantras, or sacred chants and incantations. A section called the Brāhmanas, which contains ritual instruction, and speculative discussions on the meaning of Vedic rituals, follows this. These first two portions comprise what is often called the karma khaṇḍa or “action portion” of the Vedas, or alternatively, the Pūrvamīmāṃsā ("former inquiry"). (The philosophical school of Pūrvamīmāṃsā takes its name from its focus on the early part of the Vedas.)

Many of the hymns of the karma khaṇḍa ask for special favors from deities, and emphasize the worldly rewards of artha (economic prosperity) and kāma (sensual pleasure) that come from propitiating gods through prescribed sacrifices. However, the earlier portion of the Vedas is not entirely devoid of lofty or philosophical significance. Many of the mantras resurface in the latter portion of the Vedas as dense expressions of metaphysical theses. Moreover, many portions of the karma khaṇḍa elaborate the significance of the various Vedic deities, which surpass the role that could be attributed to them in a polytheistic context. Instead, what one finds frequently is the elevation of a single deity to the level of the cosmic soul (for example, see the Śrī Rudra).

A recurrent cosmological and ethical vision appears to emerge in the karma khaṇḍa. This is the idea that the universe is a closed ethical system, supported by a system of reciprocal sacrifice and obligation. In this context, the karma khaṇḍa promotes the practice of animal sacrifices to the gods, to ensure that conditions on earth are livable and fruitful for all of its inhabitants. A related doctrine that begins to emerge in portions of the karma khaṇḍa is the four-fold caste system that sets out strict obligations for all to fulfill, along with the idea that the caste-social order is divinely ordained. This is most clearly related in the Puruṣa Sūkta, a section of mantras from the Ṛg Veda. According to the Puruṣa Sūkta, the universe, as we know it, is a result of the self-sacrifice of a Cosmic Person (an ultimate God, later identified with Viṣṇu or Śiva, depending upon sectarian contexts). Upon being bound and sacrificed by the gods, the various portions of the Cosmic Person become the various castes: the head becomes the Brahmins, the arms become the Ksatriya caste, the thighs become the Vaiśya caste, and the feet become the Sūdra caste. While the caste system may be a pervasively Indian phenomenon, the idea that the caste system is divinely ordained appears to be found in Hindu philosophies in proportion to the weight they give to the authority of the karma khaṇḍa.

ii. Jñana Khaṇḍa or Knowledge Section of the Vedas

The karma khaṇḍa is followed by the Āraṇyakas, or forest books, which for the most part eschew rituals, and are far more speculative. After the Āraṇyakas come the section of the Vedas known as the “ Upaniṣads,” which consist of a dialogue between a teacher and student on metaphysical, axiological and cosmological issues. Whereas the goal of the early portion of the Vedas is action, the goal of the latter portion of the Vedas is jñāna (knowledge) of Brahman (a neuter term for the Ultimate, depicted in the Upaniṣads as the ultimate God). Further, the Upaniṣads identify Brahman with Ātma (Self) and suggest that knowing this entity will save one from all sorrow (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad 7) and result in liberation. Brahman or Ātma is additionally presented as the omniscient, omnipotent and omnipresent entity hidden from plain view, but known through philosophical speculation that is driven by dissatisfaction with earthly rewards. This latter part of the Vedas is often referred to as the uttara mīmāṃsā ("higher inquiry"), or the vedānta, which means "end of the Vedas." Alternatively, it is known as the jñāna khaṇḍa, or "knowledge portion" of the Vedas. (The Hindu schools known as Vedānta take their name from their focus on this portion of the Vedas). The sustained theme of the uttara mīmāṃsā is that the cosmos as we know it is the result of the causal efficacy of Brahman, or Ātma, that the results of works are ephemeral, and that knowledge of reality brings everlasting reward. The uttara mīmāṃsā is characterized by a pervasive dissatisfaction with ritual (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad I.ii.10).

The specific relationship between the individual and Brahman, or Ātma, is a matter of controversy amongst commentators on the latter portions of the Vedas. Four major commentarial schools evolved to interpret the import of the later portions of the Vedas. This confirms the suspicion that the actual position of the Upaniṣads is less than clear, or at least debatable. (See Vedānta.)

b. Secondary Texts: Smṛti Literature

On many traditional Hindu accounts (specifically the account found in the Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta schools), the Vedas are regarded as “śruti”, "heard" or revealed texts, and are contrasted with smṛti or remembered texts. The smṛti texts are far more numerous, but purport to be based upon the learning of the Vedas. Unlike the Vedas, the smṛtis were traditionally regarded as appropriate for general consumption, while the Vedas were regarded as the sole preserve of the high castes. The smṛti literature, as a rule, was originally authored in Sanskrit. Over time, however, translations into vernacular languages became popular, and additional texts were authored in vernaculars.

The tradition of smṛti literature stretches back to the end of the Vedic period, and in some ways is still very much alive today. The smṛti texts can all be read as attempting to unify the seemingly divergent goals of the action section of the Vedas (being morality, or dharma) and the knowledge section of the Vedas (being liberation or mokṣa). The overall strategy offered in the various smṛti texts is to affirm a moral scheme known traditionally as varna āśrama dharma, or the morality of caste (varna) and station in life (āśrama). This scheme reconciles the demands of dharma and mokṣa, as well as artha and kāma, by apportioning different stages of life to the pursuit of different ends. At the end of childhood, and before the beginning of adolescence, an individual is typically expected to be a celibate student (brahmacarya), and learn one caste’s ways. Then at an appropriate age they are to marry and become a householder (gṛhastha). During this stage an individual is permitted and expected to pursue the ends of kāma or sensual pleasure through married life and artha or economic prosperity through caste occupations. After raising a family, a couple is to retire to the forest and become forest dwellers (vānaprastha), to facilitate their transition from a life focused on kāma and artha to a life geared towards liberation. Finally, individuals give up all possessions, renounce society and become a ascetic (sannyāsa) at which point they are to focus solely on mokṣa or spiritual liberation.

There are three prominent varieties of smṛti literature that are important to the study of Hindu philosophy. Though they for the most part express and extol the doctrine of varna āśrama dharma, they are composed in different styles, and with different audiences in mind.

i. Itihāsas

The best known of the smṛti literature are the great Hindu epics, such as the Mahābhārata and Rāmāyana. The focal plot of the Mahābhārata is a fratricidal war between the children of two princes. The deity Kṛṣṇa figures prominently in this epic, as a mutual cousin of both warring factions, though he is not the protagonist. The Rāmāyana is an account of the life story of the crown prince Rāma up until he vanquishes the tyrant King Rāvana and successfully rescues his wife and the crown princess Sītā from Rāvana’s grips. Both Kṛṣṇa and Rāma are traditionally regarded as human incarnations of Viṣṇu. Both the Mahābhārata and Rāmāyana are grouped under the heading of itihāsa (‘thus spoken’) literature. The focal events of the two epics likely occurred between 1000 B.C.E. and 700 A.D. (Thapar p. 31) though the epics themselves appear to have gone through a long process of revision and evolution before their final Sanskrit versions appear on the scene in the first two centuries of the common era.

Itihāsas, though recorded in the form of a narrative, are littered with philosophical discussions on cosmology, and ethics. The most philosophically famous portion of the itihāsa literature is the Bhagavad Gītā. The Bhagavad Gītā forms a portion of the Mahābhārata, but owing to its importance in the tradition it is often regarded as a stand-alone text.

ii. Bhagavad Gītā

The Bhagavad Gītā consists of a discourse given by Kṛṣṇa on the eve of the battle of the fratricidal war of the Mahābhārata to his cousin Arjuna, who becomes despondent at the thought of engaging in a war whose main aim is resting control over the throne, at the expense of the destruction of his family. Kṛṣṇa exhorts Arjuna to do his duty as a Ksatriya and fight the war that he has been charged with (Bhagavad Gītā 2:31). For “[b]etter is one’s own duty, though ill done, than the duty of another well done….” (Bhagavad Gītā 18:47; cf. Manu X. 97). In keeping with the general theme of the smṛti literature, Kṛṣṇa focuses on reconciling the goal of mokṣa with that of dharma. Kṛṣṇa’s first solution to the problem of the conflict of dharma and mokṣa involves doing one’s duty with a strong deontological consciousness, which attends to duty for duty’s sake, and not for its rewards. This deontological attitude not only perfects moral action, on Kṛṣṇa’s account, but it also constitutes true renunciation, which is a prerequisite to mokṣa. Kṛṣṇa calls the deontological renunciation of rewards of dutiful action karma yoga, or the discipline (yoga) of action (karma) (Bhagavad Gītā ch.3). This is not the only type of yoga that Kṛṣṇa prescribes. He also propounds what he identifies as distinct yogas (Bhagavad Gītā chs. 4-11) that might be grouped under the heading of jñāna yoga, or the discipline (yoga) of knowledge (jñāna), whereby one develops a detached attitude towards the fruits of works through knowledge of the excellences and unchanging nature of the transcendent (sometimes spoken of as “Brahman” in this text), and the ephemeral and temporary nature of worldly accomplishments. To this end, Kṛṣṇa calls upon the philosophy of Sāṅkhya and Yoga, as well as the philosophical concepts of the Upaniṣads to explicate the nature of the changing and the transcendent. Finally, Kṛṣṇa also prescribes what he calls bhakti yoga or the “discipline (yoga) of devotion (bhakti)” (Bhagavad Gītā chs. 12-18). Whereas in karma yoga, one merely gives up fruits of actions, in bhakti yoga one offers the fruits of one’s actions to God. Whereas in jñāna yoga one pursues knowledge for its own sake, in bhakti yoga one pursues knowledge for the sake of a loving relationship with the Ultimate. Kṛṣṇa appears to hold that any of the ways that he prescribes will result in liberation for all three varieties of yogas will ensure that the obstacle to liberation—attachment to fruits of actions—is over come.

iii. Purāṇas

Purāna” means history and is the term applied to a group of texts that share a few features: (a) they typically provide a detailed history of the origin of the various gods and the Universe, and (b) they are written in praise of the exploits of a particular deity. Unlike the itihāsas, the Purāṇas are not restricted to incarnations of deities, but describe the activities of the deities, including their incarnations. The Purāṇa literature comes down to us from a time that post dates the composition of the Vedas, though their precise dates of composition are not known (cf. Thapar p.29). There are many Purāṇas, though the most famous is likely the Bhāgavata Purāṇa.

The Bhāgavata Purāṇa is distinguished amongst Purāṇas for being regarded by Gaudiya Vaiṣṇavism, founded by the medieval Bengali saint Caitanya, as the ultimate revelation on all doctrinal matters. This tradition has come into prominence in recent times in the form of the International Society for Kṛṣṇa Consciousness, commonly known as the Hare Kṛṣṇa movement. According to the Bhāgavata Purāṇa, the Ultimate (Brahman) is both identical with and distinct from creation: on this account, Brahman converts itself into the universe but maintains a distinct identity all the same. The Bhāgavata Purāṇa also identifies Viṣṇu with Brahman, and holds that bhakti (devotion) is the chief means of attaining liberation, which consists in the personal absorption of the individual (jīva) in Brahman. The Bhāgavata Purāṇa thus presents one of the famous and enduring theistic expressions of the Bhedābheda philosophy. In the way of ethics, the Bhāgavata Purāṇa strays little from the Varna āśrama dharma found in most smṛti literature (Bhāgavata Purāṇa I.ii.9-12), though it advocates what it calls “bhāgavata dharma” (bhāgavata ethic) which is a combination of the karma yoga and bhakti yoga of the Gītā supplemented with an emphasis on living the life characteristic of a devotee of Kṛṣṇa as described in the Bhāgavata Purāṇa (XI.iii.23-31).

iv. Dharmaśāstra

The term “dharmaśāstra” literally means treaties or science (śāstra) of dharma. The term refers to a corpus of literature clearly authored by Brahmins with the aim of reinforcing a particular conception of Varna āśrama dharma: a moral theory that critics will note ensures that Brahmins are allotted a privileged or crowning position in the caste scheme. The dharmaśāstras contain many features of other smṛti literature that make them philosophically interesting.

Like the Purāṇa literature, many of the dharmaśāstras provide accounts of the origins of the universe, and sometimes they delve into the question of the means to liberation. Their dominant concern however is to prescribe the specific duties and privileges of each caste. After attending to the political question of the proper ordering of society, the dharmaśāstras typically focus on the matter of prayaścitta, or ritual expiation (see Kane vol.4 ch.1 pp. 1-40).

The idea of ritual expiation can be understood as a procedure concerned with alleviating ritual impurity. However, it also has clear moral implications: prayaścittas are prescribed for every manner of offence, and if an agent undertakes the appropriate prayaścitta, they can atone for their moral transgressions. A prayaścitta can take the form of a ritual, an act of charity, or corporal punishment. The idea that one can ritually atone for moral transgressions is unique to the dharmaśāstras, and related texts in the history of Hindu philosophy.

3. Stage Two: Systematic Hindu Philosophy: the Darśanas

Core Hindu canonical texts—the Vedas—form the textual backdrop against which many of the systematic Hindu philosophies are articulated. However, they do not exhaust the import of Hindu philosophy for two main reasons. First, the Vedas are not composed with the intention of being systematic treaties on philosophical issues. They leave many issues of philosophy relatively untouched. Secondly, the core Hindu canonical texts are not canonical in the same way for all Hindus. By and large, those we tend to regard as Hindu accord some type of provisional authority to both the Vedas, and the secondary Vedic literature. However, the authority accorded is something that Hindu thinkers have disagreed upon. Some of the foundational works in systematic Hindu philosophy do not explicitly mention the Vedas (for example, the Sāṅkhya Kārikā), leaving the impression that these schools were tolerant of the authority of the Vedas, but not philosophically wedded to it in any deep sense.

The term “darśana” in Sanskrit translates as "vision" and is conventionally regarded as designating what we are inclined to look upon as systematic philosophical views. The history of Indian philosophy is replete with darśanas. The number of darśanas to be found in the history of Indian philosophy depends largely on the organizational question of how one is to enumerate darśanas: how much difference between expressions of philosophical views can be tolerated before we are inclined to count texts as expressing distinct darśanas? The question seems particularly pertinent in cases like Buddhist and Jain philosophy, which have all had rich philosophical histories. The issue is relatively easier to settle in the context of Hindu philosophy, for a convention has developed over the centuries to count systematic Hindu philosophy as being comprised of six (āstika, or Veda recognizing) darśanas. The six darśanas are: Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, Pūrvamīmāṃsā, and Vedānta.

As a rule, systematic Indian philosophy (Hinduism, Jainism and Buddhism) was recorded in Sanskrit, the pan-Indian language of scholarship, after the end of the Vedic period. While scholars are confident about the approximate dates that the texts of systematic Indian philosophy handed down to us were written (cf. Potter, “Bibliography,” Encyclopaedia of Indian Philosophies, vol.1) scholars are not in many cases as confident about the age of the schools themselves. Moreover, most of the schools of Hindu philosophy have existed side by side. Thus, the order of explication of the systematic schools of Hindu philosophy follows the conventional order of explication and not any particular historical order.

a. Nyāya

The term "nyāya" traditionally had the meaning "formal reasoning," though in later times it also came to be used for reasoning in general, and by extension, the legal reasoning of traditional Indian law courts. Opponents of the Nyāya school of philosophy frequently reduce it to the status of an arm of Hindu philosophy devoted to questions of logic and rhetoric. While reasoning is very important to Nyāya, this school also had important things to say on the topic of epistemology, theology and metaphysics, rendering it a comprehensive and autonomous school of Indian philosophy.

The Nyāya school of Hindu philosophy has had a long and illustrious history. The founder of this school is the sage Gautama (2nd cent. C.E.)—not to be confused with the Buddha, who on many accounts had the name “Gautama” as well. Nyāya went through at least two stages in the history of Indian philosophy. At an earlier, purer stage, proponents of Nyāya sought to elaborate a philosophy that was distinct from contrary darśanas. At a later stage, some Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika authors (such as Śaṅkara-Misra, 15th cent. C.E.) became increasingly syncretistic and viewed their two schools as sister darśanas. As well, at the latter stages of the Nyāya tradition, the philosopher Gaṅgeśa (14th cent. C.E.) narrowed the focus to the epistemological issues discussed by the earlier authors, while leaving off metaphysical matters and so initiated a new school, which came to be known as Navya Nyāya, or “New” Nyāya. Our focus will be mainly on classical, non-syncretic, Nyāya.

According to the first verse of the Nyāya-Sūtra, the Nyāya school is concerned with shedding light on sixteen topics: pramāna (epistemology), prameya (ontology), saṃśaya (doubt), prayojana (axiology, or “purpose”), dṛṣṭānta(paradigm cases that establish a rule), Siddhānta (established doctrine), avayava (premise of a syllogism), tarka (reductio ad absurdum), nirnaya (certain beliefs gained through epistemically respectable means), vāda (appropriately conducted discussion), jalpa (sophistic debates aimed at beating the opponent, and not at establishing the truth), vitaṇḍa(a debate characterized by one party’s disinterest in establishing a positive view, and solely with refutation of the opponent’s view), hetvābhāsa (persuasive but fallacious arguments), chala (unfair attempt to contradict a statement by equivocating its meaning), jāti (an unfair reply to an argument based on a false analogy), and nigrahasthāna (ground for defeat in a debate) (Nyāya-Sūtra and Vātsyāyana’s Bhāṣya I.1.1-20).

With respect to the question of epistemology, the Nyāya-Sūtra recognizes four avenues of knowledge: these are perception, inference, analogy, and verbal testimony of reliable persons. Perception arises when the senses make contact with the object of perception. Inference comes in three varieties: pūrvavat (a priori), śeṣavat (a posteriori) and sāmanyatodṛṣṭa (common sense) (Nyāya-Sūtra I.1.3–7).

The Nyāya's acceptance of both arguments from analogy and testimony as means of knowledge, allows it to accomplish two theological goals. First, it allows Nyāya to claim that the Veda’s are valid owing to the reliability of their transmitters (Nyāya-Sūtra II.1.68). Secondly, the acceptance of arguments from analogy allows the Nyāya philosophers to forward a natural theology based on analogical reasoning. Specifically, the Nyāya tradition is famous for the argument that God’s existence can be known for (a) all created things resemble artifacts, and (b) just as every artifact has a creator, so too must all of creation have a creator (Udayanācārya and Haridāsa Nyāyālaṃkāra I.3-4).

The metaphysics that pervades the Nyāya texts is both realistic and pluralistic. On the Nyāya view the plurality of reasonably believed things exist and have an identity independently of their contingent relationship with other objects. This applies as much to mundane objects, as it does to the self, and God. The ontological model that appears to pervade Nyāya metaphysical thinking is that of atomism, the view that reality is composed of indecomposable simples (cf. Nyāya-Sūtra IV.2.4.16).

Nyāya’s treatment of logical and rhetorical issues, particularly in the Nyāya Sūtra, consists in an extended inventory acceptable and unacceptable argumentatio